The moral philosophy of St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) involves a merger of at least two apparently disparate traditions: Aristotelian eudaimonism and Christian theology. On the one hand, Aquinas follows Aristotle in thinking that an act is good or bad depending on whether it contributes to or deters us from our proper human end—the telos or final goal at which all human actions aim. That telos is eudaimonia, or happiness, where “happiness” is understood in terms of completion, perfection, or well-being. Achieving happiness, however, requires a range of intellectual and moral virtues that enable us to understand the nature of happiness and motivate us to seek it in a reliable and consistent way.
On the other hand, Aquinas believes that we can never achieve complete or final happiness in this life. For him, final happiness consists in beatitude, or supernatural union with God. Such an end lies far beyond what we through our natural human capacities can attain. For this reason, we not only need the virtues, we also need God to transform our nature—to perfect or “deify” it—so that we might be suited to participate in divine beatitude. Moreover, Aquinas believes that we inherited a propensity to sin from our first parent, Adam. While our nature is not wholly corrupted by sin, it is nevertheless diminished by sin’s stain, as evidenced by the fact that our wills are at enmity with God’s. Thus we need God’s help in order to restore the good of our nature and bring us into conformity with his will. To this end, God imbues us with his grace which comes in the form of divinely instantiated virtues and gifts.
This article first considers Aquinas’s metaethical views. Those views provide a good context for understanding his unique synthesis of Christian teaching and Aristotelian philosophy. Also, his meta-ethical views provide an ideal background for understanding other features of his moral philosophy such as the nature of human action, virtue, natural law, and the ultimate end of human beings. While contemporary moral philosophers tend to address these subjects as discrete topics of study, Aquinas’s treatment of them yields a bracing, comprehensive view of the moral life. This article presents these subjects in a way that illuminates their interconnected roles.
Aquinas’s metaethical views are indebted to the writings of several Christian thinkers, particularly Augustine’s Confessions, Boethius’s De hebdomadibus, and perhaps Anselm’s Monologium. Due to the constraints of space, the present section will only consider Augustine’s influence on Aquinas’s views.
According to Augustine, “things that exist are good” (Confessions VII.12). This claim is meant to express a basic metaphysical idea, namely, that if something exists, then it necessarily has some degree of goodness. Augustine’s argument for this claim is as follows. We can divide existing things into two categories: incorruptible things and corruptible things, with the latter being inferior to the former. If something is incorruptible, then by definition it cannot be made worse; that is, it cannot lose whatever goodness it may have. On the other hand, if something is corruptible, then it can be made worse. Notice that a thing’s being corruptible presupposes having goodness. Otherwise, it would not have any goodness it could lose. While this argument may be sufficient to show that corruptible things necessarily have goodness, Augustine uses it to identify a problem with the view that something can exist even if it has no goodness at all. For if something has no goodness, then it cannot lose goodness and must therefore be incorruptible. And since incorruptibility is better than corruptibility, it looks as if something lacking goodness is better than its corruptible counterpart, which has goodness. Clearly, this is incoherent. Augustine writes: “What can be more monstrous than to maintain that by losing all [its] goodness [something can] become better” (Ibid.)? Yet this is precisely the implication of claiming that something with no goodness whatsoever can exist. According to Augustine, the only remedy for this problem is to deny the existence of things that have no goodness. If something exists, then it must necessarily have goodness.
Echoing the general thrust of Augustine’s argument, Aquinas claims that “Goodness and being are really the same.” (Summa Theologiae [hereafter ST] Ia 5.1). The term “being” here is roughly equivalent to what is actual or existing. Thus what Aquinas means to convey is that something is good insofar as it actual. By contrast, evil has no actuality in its own right. It would be a mistake, then, to speak of evil as an actual “thing,” if by “thing” we mean an existing being or quality. For evil is a deprivation of what is actual, like blindness or sickness. For this reason, Aquinas says that something is evil “inasmuch as it is deprived of some particular good that pertains to its due or proper perfection” (QDM 1.1 ad 1; ST Ia 48.2 passim). Again, Augustine’s influence is clear. For him, something is evil insofar as its existence is diminished or corrupted in some way. If something had no goodness whatsoever, it would lack all goods, even the good of existence itself. Augustine says, “if something where deprived of all goodness, it would be altogether nothing; therefore as long as something is, it is good” (Confessions,VII.12).
Aquinas’s meta-ethics is also indebted to an Aristotelian view of living things. Following Aristotle, Aquinas says that living things are composites of matter and substantial form. By “substantial form” he means a principle that organizes matter into a discrete substance equipped with certain powers or “potentialities.” On this view, a thing’s substantial form constitutes the nature a thing has; it is the metaphysical aspect in virtue of which a substance is the kind of thing it is and has the species-defining powers it has (ST Ia 76.1; Cf. Ia 5.5; IaIIae 85.4). Aquinas goes on to argue that all substances seek their own perfection (ST Ia 6.1). That is, they all seek as their final end a fully realized state of existence or actuality. Yet a substance cannot achieve that final end without exercising the powers it has in virtue of its substantial form. As Scott MacDonald explains: “The end, completion, or perfection of a natural substance is its having fully actualized its specifying capacity [or power], its actually performing the activity for which its form or nature provides the capacity” (MacDonald, 1991a: 5). In other words, a substance achieves its perfection through the proper exercise of its species-defining powers. And because Aquinas thinks that existence and goodness have the same referent, it appears that the proper exercise of those powers also contributes to that substance’s goodness. For “since the state or activity that constitutes a substance’s full actuality is that substance’s end and an end is good, that state or activity constitutes the substance’s good.” (Ibid.).
Aquinas considers a fairly straightforward objection to this view: “Goodness can be more or less. But being cannot be more or less. Therefore goodness differs from being” (ST Ia 5.1 obj. 3). In other words, goodness is a relative property. Some people are morally better than other people. Some horses are more developed and better trained than other horses. Some organs are healthier and function better than organs. In each case, the goodness things have will not be identical in terms of quantity. On the other hand, being (understood in terms of being actual or existing) is not varied in this way. Something either exists or it doesn’t. This crucial difference seems to prove that being and goodness cannot be the same. In addressing this worry, Aquinas concedes that there is a kind of existence, or being, that is all-or-nothing. He calls this “substantial being,” or being simply. Something has substantial being as long as it is actual or exists (ST Ia 5.1 ad 1). We might also claim that every thing that has substantial being also has substantialgoodness. That is, something is good insofar it exists or has being.
On the other hand, members of the same species can enjoy different grades of maturity or completeness. As Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump explain, something may be “a more or less fully developed actualized specimen” (Kretzmann and Stump, 1988: 292). For example, a healthy adult dog is more developed—that is, more actualized—than a puppy, whose fledgling state prevents it from participating in those activities characteristic of more mature dogs (e.g., reproduction, nurturing their young, etc.). The actuality referred to here is what Aquinas calls relative being. He says: “by its substantial being, everything is said to have being simply; but by any further actuality it is said to have being relatively” (STIa 5.1 ad 1). The idea of “relative being” refers to the quality that accrues when a living thing exercises its species-defining capacities and, in turn, becomes a more perfect. Again, by “more perfect” Aquinas simply means “more actual.” For “anything whatever is perfect to the extent that it is in actuality, since potentiality without actuality is imperfect” (ST IaIIae 3.2). And just as a thing’s relative being is a matter of degree, so there is a kind of goodness—“relative goodness”—that corresponds to the degree of actuality a thing has. For “goodness [in the current sense] is spoken of as more or less according to a thing’s superadded actuality”—the kind of actuality that goes beyond a thing’s mere substantial being (STIa 5.1 ad 3; ST IaIIae 18.1; SCG III 3, 4).
The forgoing analysis provides the conceptual background for understanding the nature of human goodness. As we have seen, something is good to the extent that its species-defining powers are properly actualized. For Aquinas, the species-defining characteristic of human beings is reason. And since something achieves goodness by exercising its species-defining powers, it follows that reason’s proper exercise will result in human goodness. Kretzmann and Stump put the point this way: “human goodness, like any goodness appropriate to one’s species, is acquired by performing instances of the operations specific to its species, which in the case of humanity is the rational employment of rational powers” (Kretzmann and Stump, 1988: 287). In short, human goodness ultimately consists in the proper exercise of a person’s rational capacities. This analysis of human goodness serves to guide our evaluation of human actions. Whether an action is good (or bad) depends on whether it is commensurate with (or contrary to) our nature as rational beings. In this way, the real difference between good and bad actions is a difference in relation to reason (ST IaIIae 18.5).
According to Aquinas’s metaethics, human goodness depends on performing acts that are in accord with our human nature. But what but sort of acts are those? In other words, what feature or features serve to distinguish human acts from acts of a different kind? Here we must go beyond the simple claim that an action is human just insofar as it is rational. For while this claim is no doubt true, the nature of rationality itself needs explanation. This section seeks to explore more fully just what rationality or reason consists in according to Aquinas. Only then can we understand the nature of human action and the end at which such action aims.
Aquinas provides the most comprehensive treatment of this subject in the second part of the Summa theologiae. There, he explains that reason is comprised of two powers: one cognitive, the other appetitive. The cognitive power is the intellect, which enables us to know and understand. The intellect also enables us to apprehend the goodness a thing has. The appetitive power of reason is called the will. Aquinas describes the will as a native desire for the understood good. That is, it is an appetite that is responsive to the intellect’s estimations of what is good or choiceworthy (ST Ia 82.1; QDV 3.22.12). On this view, all acts of will are dependent on antecedent acts of intellect; the intellect must supply the will with the object to which the latter inclines. In turn, that object moves the will as a final cause “because the good understood is the object of the will, and moves it as an end” (ST Ia 82.4).
From the abbreviated account of intellect and will provided thus far, it may appear that the intellect necessitates the will’s acts by its own evaluative portrayals of goodness. Yet Aquinas insists that no single account of the good can necessitate the will’s movement. Most goods do not have a necessary connection to happiness. That is, we do not need them in order to be happy; thus the will does not incline to them of necessity (ST Ia 82.2). But what of those goods that do have a necessary connection to happiness? What about the goodness of God or those virtues that lead us to God “in whom alone true happiness consists” (Ibid.)? According to Aquinas, the will does not incline necessarily to these goods, either. For in this life we cannot see God in all his goodness, and thus the connection between God, virtue, final happiness will always appear opaque. Aquinas writes: “until through the certitude of the Divine Vision the necessity of such connection be shown, the will does not adhere to God of necessity, nor to those things which are of God” (Ibid.).
In this life, then, our intellectual limitations prevent us from apprehending what is good simpliciter. Instead, we are presented with competing goods between which we must choose (ST Ia 82.2 ad 1). Some goods provide immediate gratification but no long-term fulfillment. Other goods may precipitate hardship but eventually make us better people. Indeed, sometimes we must exercise considerable effort in ignoring superficial or petty pleasures while attending to more difficult yet enduring goods. To employ Aquinas’s parlance, the will must exercise efficient causality on the intellect by instructing it to consider some goods rather than others (ST Ia 82.4). This happens whenever we, through our own determination, direct our attention away from certain desirable objects and toward those we think are more choiceworthy. Of course, our character will often govern the goods we desire and ultimately choose. Even so, Aquinas does not think that our character wholly determines our choices, as evidenced by the fact that we sometimes make decisions that are contrary to our established habits. This is actually fortunate for us, for it suggests that even people disposed toward evil can manage to make good choices and perhaps begin to correct their more hardened and inordinate inclinations.
Now we are prepared to answer the question posed at the beginning of this section: what actions are those we can designate as human? The answer is this: human actions are those over which one has voluntary control (ST IaIIae 1.1). Unlike non-rational animals, human beings choose their actions according to a reasoned account of what they think is good. Seen this way, human actions are not products of deterministic causal forces. They are products of our own free judgment (liberum arbitrium), the exercise of which is a function of both intellect and will (ST Ia 83.3). When discussing what it is that makes an action “human,” then, Aquinas has in mind those capacities whereby one judges and chooses what is good. For it is through one’s ability to deliberate and judge in this way that one exercises mastery over one’s actions (ST IaIIae 1.1).
So far, we’ve established that human actions are actions that are governed by a reasoned consideration of what is good. Aquinas also thinks that the good in question functions as an end—the object for the sake of which the agent acts. “For the object of the will is the end and the good” (Ibid.). There are two worries that emerge here, both of which can be resolved rather quickly. First, it seems we do not always act for the sake of an end. Many actions we perform are not products of our own deliberation and voluntary judgment (like nervous twitches, coughs, or unconscious tapping of the foot). Yet Aquinas points out that acts of this sort are not properly human acts “since they do not proceed from the deliberation of the reason” (Ibid., ad 3). In order for an act to count as a human act, it must be a product of the agent’s reasoned consideration about what is good. Second, it appears that Aquinas is mistaken when he says that the ends for the sake of which we act are good. Clearly, many things we pursue in life are not good. Aquinas does not deny this. He agrees that cognitive errors and excessive passion can distort our moral views and, in turn, incline us to choose the wrong things. Aquinas’s point, however, is that our actions are done for the sake of what we believe (rightly or wrongly) to be good. Whether the ends we pursue are in fact good is a separate question—one to which we will return below.
Aquinas does not simply wish to defend the claim that human acts are for the sake of some good. Following Augustine, he insists that our actions are for the sake of a final good—a last end which we desire for its own sake and for the sake of which everything else is chosen (ST Ia 1.6 sed contra ). If there was no such end, we would have a hard time explaining why anyone chooses to do anything at all. The reason for this is as follows. Aquinas argues that for every action or series of actions there must be something that is first in “order of intention” (ST Ia 1.4). In other words, there must be some end or good that is intrinsically desirable and serves the will’s final cause. According to this view, such a good is a catalyst for desire and is therefore necessary in order for us to act for the sake of what we desire. MacDonald writes, “one can explain [a given action] only by appealing to some end or good that is itself capable of moving the will—that is, by appealing to an end that is viewed desirable in itself” (MacDonald, 1991b: 44). Were you to remove the intrinsically desirable end, then you would remove the very principle that motivates us to act in the first place (ST IaIIae 1.4). This account also helps explain why we cannot postulate an “indefinite series of ends” when explaining human actions (Ibid.). For the existence of an indefinite series of ends would mean that there is no intrinsically desirable good for the sake of which we act. In the absence of any such good, we would not desire anything and thus never have the necessary motivation to act (Ibid.). So there must be a last end or final good that we desire for its own sake.
This last claim still does not capture what Aquinas ultimately wishes to show, namely, that there is a singleend for the sake of which all of us act (ST IaIIae 1.5). To put the matter as starkly as possible, Aquinas wants to argue that every human act of every human being is for the sake of a single end that is the same for everyone (ST IaIIae 1.5-7). The previous argument did not require us to think that the final end for which we act is the same for everyone. Nor did it show that the end at which every human being aims consists in a specific, solitary good (as opposed to a constellation of goods). What, exactly, is this last end at which we aim? As we saw in the preceding section, all of us seek after our own perfection (ST Ia 1.6). We do so by performing actions we think will—directly or indirectly—contribute to or facilitate a life that is more complete or fulfilling than it would be otherwise. In other words, the last end—the end or good that we desire for its own sake—is happiness, whereby “happiness” Aquinas means the sort of perfection or fulfillment just described.
Admittedly, this claim is fairly abstract and uncontroversial. After all, Aquinas does not say whathappiness consists in–the thing in which it is realized. He simply wishes to show that there is something everyone desires and pursues, namely, ultimate fulfillment. He says, “everyone desires the fulfillment of their perfection, and it is precisely this fulfillment in which the last end consists” (ST IaIIae 1.7; emphasis mine). So construed, the idea of the last end is, as MacDonald explains, a “formal concept…of the complete and perfect good, that which completely satisfies desire” (MacDonald, 1991b: 61). But while everyone acts for the sake of such an end abstractly conceived, Aquinas recognizes that there is considerable disagreement over what it is in which happiness consists (ST IaIIae 1.7). So there is a difference between the idea of the last end (an idea for the sake of which everyone acts) and the specific object in which the last end is thought to consist (Ibid.). Some people think that the last end consists in the acquisition of external goods, like riches, power, or fame (ST IaIIae 2.1-4). Others think it consists in goods of the body, like comeliness or physical pleasure (ST IaIIae 2.5 and 6). And still others think that happiness consists in acquiring goods of the soul such as knowledge, virtue, and friendship (ST IaIIae 2.7). But as laudable as some of these good are (particularly those of the latter category), they are all beset with unique deficiencies that preclude them from providing the kind of complete fulfillment characteristic of final happiness.
What is it, then, in which our last end really consists or is realized? For Aquinas, the last end of happiness can only consist in that which is perfectly good, which is God. Because God is perfect goodness, he is the only one capable of fulfilling our heart’s deepest longing and facilitating the perfection at which we aim. Thus he says that human beings “attain their last end by knowing and loving God” (ST IaIIae 1.8). Aquinas refers to this last end—the state in which perfect happiness consists—as the beatific vision. The beatific vision is a supernatural union with God, the enjoyment of which surpasses the satisfaction afforded by those goods people sometimes associate with the last end. But if perfect happiness consists in the beatific vision, then why do people fail to seek it? Actually, all people do seek it—at least in some sense. As we have already noted, all of us desire our own perfection, which is synonymous with final happiness. Unfortunately, many of our actions are informed by mistaken views of what happiness really consists in. These views may be the result of some intellectual or cognitive error (say if one’s views are the result of ignorance or ill-informed deliberation). But more than likely, our mistaken views will be the result of certain appetitive excesses that corrupt our understanding of what is really good. For this reason, good actions require excellences—or virtues—of both mind and appetite. The next section seeks to explain more fully what those virtues are and why we need them.
Aquinas offers several definitions of virtue. According to one very general account, a virtue is a habit that “disposes an agent to perform its proper operation or movement” (DVC 1; ST IaIIae 49.1). Because we know that reason is the proper operation of human beings, it follows that a virtue is a habit that disposes us to reason well. This account is too broad for our present purposes. While all virtues contribute in some way to our rational perfection, not every virtue disposes us to live morally good lives. Some virtues are strictly intellectual perfections, such as the ability to grasp universals or the causes underlying the world’s origin and operation. For the purposes of this essay, our concern will be with those virtues that are related to moral decision and action. That is, we will consider those virtues which Aquinas (following Augustine) describes as “good [qualities] of mind whereby we live righteously” (ST IaIIae 55.4).
A cursory glance at the second part of the Summa Theologiae would reveal a host of virtues that are indicative of human goodness. But there are essentially four virtues from which Aquinas’s more extensive list flows. These virtues are prudence, justice, temperance, and courage (ST IaIIae 61.2). Aquinas refers to these virtues as the “cardinal” virtues. They are the principle habits on which the rest of the virtues hinge (cardo) (Rickaby, 2003). To put the matter another way, each cardinal virtue refers to a general type of rectitude that has various specifications. For example, the virtue of prudence (which we will consider in more detail shortly) denotes a “certain rectitude of discretion in any actions or matters whatever” (ST IaIIae 61.4; 61.3). Any virtue the point of which is to promote discretion with respect to action will be considered a part of prudence. Similarly, temperance concerns the moderation of passion, and thus will include any virtue that seeks to restrain those desires of a more or less insatiable sort (Ibid.).
Moreover, Aquinas thinks the cardinal virtues provide general templates for the most salient forms of moral activity: commanding action (prudence); giving to those what is due (justice); curbing the passions (temperance); and strengthening the passions against fear (courage) (IaIIae 61.3). A more detailed sketch of these virtues follows (although I will address them in an order that is different from the one Aquinas provides).
In order to act well, we need to make good judgments about how we should behave. This is precisely the sort of habit associated with prudence, which Aquinas defines as “wisdom concerning human affairs” (STIIaIIae 47.2 ad 1) or “right reason with respect to action” (ST IIaIIae 47.4). In order to make good moral judgments, a twofold knowledge is required: one must know (1) the general moral principles that guide actions and (2) the particular circumstances in which a decision is required. For “actions are about singular matters: and so it is necessary for the prudent man to know both the universal principles of reason, and the singulars about which actions are concerned” (ST IIaIIae 47.3; Cf. STIaIIae 18.3). This passage may appear to suggest that prudence involves a fairly simple and straightforward process of applying moral rules to specific situations. But this is somewhat misleading since the activity of prudence involves a fairly developed ability to evaluate situations themselves. As Thomas Hibbs explains: “prudence involves not simply the subordination of particulars to appropriate universals, but the appraisal of concrete, contingent circumstances” (Hibbs, 2001: 92). From this perspective, good decisions will always be responsive to what our situation requires. Thus we cannot simply consult a list of moral prescriptions in determining what we should do. We must also “grasp what is pertinent and to assess what ought to be done in complex circumstances” (Ibid., 98).
According to Aquinas, then, the virtue of prudence is a kind of intellectual aptitude that enables us to make judgments that are consonant with (and indeed ordered to) our proper end (ST IaIIae 57.5). Note here that prudence does not establish the end at which we aim. Our end is the human good, which is predetermined by our rational nature (ST IIaIIae 47.6). Nor does prudence desire that end; for whether we desire our proper end depends on whether we have the rights sorts of appetitive inclinations (as we shall see below). According to Aquinas, prudence illuminates for us the course of action deemed most appropriate for achieving our antecedently established telos. It does this through three acts: (1) counsel, whereby we inquire about the available means of achieving the end; (2) judgment, whereby we determine the proper means for achieving the end; and finally (3) command, whereby we apply that judgment (ST IIaIIae 47.8). While we need a range of appetitive excellences in order to make good choices, we also need certain intellectual excellences as well. That is, we must be able to deliberate and choose well with respect to what is ultimately good for us.
As a cardinal virtue, prudence functions as a principle virtue on which a variety of other excellences hinge. Those excellences include: memory, intelligence, docility, shrewdness, reason, foresight, circumspection, and caution (ST IIaIIae 49.1-8). Without these excellences, we may commit a number of cognitive errors that may prevent us from acting in a morally appropriate way. For example, we may reject the guidance of good counsel; make decisions precipitously; or act thoughtlessly by failing “to judge rightly through contempt or neglect of those things on which a right judgment depends” (ST IIaIIae 53.4). We may also act for the sake of goods that are contrary to our nature. This invariably happens when the passions cloud our judgment and make deficient objects of satisfaction look more choiceworthy than they really are. In order to make reliable judgments about what is really good, our passions need some measure of restraint so that they do not corrupt good judgment. In short, prudence depends on virtues of the appetite, and it is to these virtues we now turn.
Temperance has a twofold meaning. In a general sense, the term denotes a kind of moderation common to every moral virtue (ST IIaIIae 141.2). In its more restricted sense, temperance concerns the moderation of physical pleasures, especially those associated with eating, drinking, and sex (ST IIaIIae 141.4). We display a common propensity to sacrifice our well-being for the sake of these transient goods. Thus we need some virtue that serves to restrain what Aquinas calls “concupiscible passion” –the appetite whereby we desire what is pleasing and avoid what is harmful (ST Ia 82.2). Temperance is that virtue, as it denotes a restrained desire for physical gratification (ST IIaIIae 141.2, 3).
Aquinas does not think that temperance eradicates our desire for bodily pleasure. Nor does he think that temperance is a matter of desiring physical pleasure less. Such a description suggests that physical gratification is an innately deficient type of enjoyment. Yet Aquinas denies this. Physical pleasure, he says, is the result of the body’s natural operations (ST IIaIIae 141.4). According to Aquinas, the purpose of temperance is to refine the way we enjoy bodily pleasures. Specifically, it creates in the agent a proper sense of moderation with respect to what is pleasurable. For a person can more easily subordinate herself to reason when her passions are not excessive or deficient. On this view, bodily enjoyment can in fact be an integral part of a rational life. For the moderated enjoyment of bodily pleasure safeguards the good of reason and actually facilitates a more enduring kind of satisfaction. Thus Aquinas insists that “sensible and bodily goods … are not in opposition to reason, but are subject to it as instruments which reason employs in order to attain its proper end” (ST IIaIIae 141.3).
Like prudence, temperance is a cardinal virtue. There are a host of subsidiary virtues that fall under temperance because they serve to modify the most insatiable human passions. For example, chastity,sobriety and abstinence—which denote a retrenchment of sex, drink, and food, respectively—are (predictably) all parts of temperance. Yet there are other virtues associated with temperance that may strike the reader as surprising. For example, Aquinas argues that humility is a part of temperance. Humility aims to restrain the immoderate desire for what one cannot achieve. While humility is not concerned with tempering the appetites associated with touch, it nevertheless consists in a kind of restraint and thus bears a formal resemblance to temperance. He says: “whatever virtues restrain or suppress, and the actions which moderate the impetuosity of the passions, are considered parts of temperance” (ST IIaIIae 161.4). Thus Aquinas also thinks meekness, clemency, and studiousness are parts of temperance. They, too, restrain certain appetitive drives: specifically anger, the desire to punish, and the desire to pursue vain curiosities, respectively.
Temperance and its subsidiary virtues restrain the strong appetite, such as the sexual appetite But courage and its subsidiary virtues modify what Aquinas calls the irascible appetite. By “irascible appetite” Aquinas means the desire for that which is difficult to attain or avoid (ST IaIIae 23.1). Occasionally, the difficulty in achieving or avoiding certain objects can give rise to various degrees of fear and, in turn, discourage us from adhering to reason’s instruction. In these cases we may refuse to endure the pain or discomfort required for achieving our proper human good. Note here that fear is not innately contrary to reason. After all, there are some things that we should fear, like an untimely death or a bad reputation. Only when fear prevents us from facing what we ought to endure does it become inimical to reason (ST IIaIIae 125.1). In these cases, we need a virtue that moderates those appetites that prevent from undertaking more daunting tasks. According to Aquinas, courage is that virtue.
We need courage to restrain our fears so that we might endure harrowing circumstances. Yet courage not only mollifies our fears, it also combats the unreasonable zeal to overcome them. An excessive desire to face fearful circumstances constitutes a kind of recklessness that can easily hasten one’s demise. Thus we need courage in order to both curb excessive fear and modify unreasonable daring (ST IIaIIae 123.3). Without courage, we will be either governed by irrational fear or a recklessness that eschews good counsel, making us vulnerable to harm unnecessarily.
Like prudence and temperance, courage is a cardinal virtue. Those with courage will also have a considerable degree of endurance. For one must be able to “stand immovable in the midst of dangers,” especially those dangers that threaten bodily harm and death (ST IIaIIae 123.6). Lack of endurance will no doubt undermine one’s ability to bear life’s travails. The courageous person must also be confident (which is closely aligned with magnanimity). For he will not only have to endure pain and suffering, he must aggressively confront the obstacles that stand in the way of achieving his proper good. His success in confronting those obstacles requires that he exercise a “strength of hope” which arises from a confidence in his own strength, the strength of others, or the promises of God. Such hope enables him to confront threats and challenges without reservation (ST IIaIIae 129.6). The courageous person will also display magnificence, that is, a sense of nobility with respect to the importance of his endeavors. Quoting Tully, Aquinas underscores the value of what the courageous person seeks to attain by executing his actions with a “greatness of purpose” (ST IIaIIae 128.1). Finally, the courageous person will havepatience and perseverance. That is, he will not be broken by stress or sorrow, nor will he be wearied or discouraged due to the exigencies of his endeavors (Ibid.).
The virtues we have considered thus far concern our own state. The virtue of justice, however, governs our relationships with others (ST IIaIIae 57.1). Specifically, it denotes a sustained or constant willingness to extend to each person what he or she deserves (ST IIaIIae 58.1). Beyond this, Aquinas’s account of justice exhibits considerable breadth, complexity, and admits of various distinctions. Constraints of space, however, force me to mention only two sets of distinctions: (1) legal (or general) and particular justice, and (2) commutative and distributive justice.
The purpose of legal justice is to govern our actions according to the common good (ST IIaIIae 58.6). Construed this way, justice is a general virtue which concerns not individual benefits but community welfare. According to Aquinas, everyone who is a member of a community stands to that community as a part to a whole (ST IIaIIae 58.5). Whatever affects the part also affects the whole. And so whatever is good (or harmful) for oneself will also be good (or harmful) for the community of which one is a part. For this reason, we should expect the good community to enact laws that will govern its members in ways that are beneficial to everyone. This focus—the welfare of the community—is what falls under the purview of legal justice.
A clarification is in order. Aquinas acknowledges that legal justice does not appear to be altogether different from the virtues we previously considered. After all, courage, temperance, and prudence are just as likely to contribute to others’ welfare as legal justice. Yet these virtues differ logically from legal justice because they have specific objects of their own (ST IIaIIae 58.6). Whereas legal justice concerns the common good, prudence concerns commanding action, temperance concerns curbing concupiscent passion, and courage concerns strengthening irascible passion against fear. To put the matter as baldly as possible, the purpose of the other virtues is to make us good people; making us good citizens is the end at which legal justice aims (Ibid., sed contra). Of course, it would be a mistake to conclude from this account that the other virtues have nothing to do with the common good. Failure to moderate our baser appetites not only forestalls the development of personal virtue but leads to acts which are contrary to others’ well being. For example, restraining impetuous sexual appetite is the province of temperance. But as Thomas Williams insightfully points out, “sexuality [also] has implications for the common good.” For “there are precepts of justice that regulate our sex lives: fornication and adultery are violations not only of chastity but also of justice” (Williams, 2005: xvii). Thus Aquinas insists that temperance can do more than just modify our sexual drives. So long as it is shaped or informed by legal justice, temperance can direct us to preserve the common good in our actions (ST IIaIIae 58.6). We can say the same for prudence and courage. Legal justice must govern all acts of virtue to ensure that they achieve their end in a way that is commensurate with the good of others.
Now, we cannot fulfill the demands of justice only by considering what legal (or general) justice requires. We also need particular justice—the virtue which governs our interactions with individual citizens. Unlike general justice, particular justice directs us not to the good of the community but to the good of individual neighbors, colleagues, and other people with whom we interact regularly. Initially, it may appear as if particular justice is a superfluous virtue. As one objection to Aquinas’s view states, “general justice directs man sufficiently in all his relations with other men. Therefore there is no need for a particular justice” (ST IIaIIae 58.7 obj. 1). Aquinas agrees that general justice can direct us to the good of others, but only indirectly (ST IIaIIae 58.7 ad 1). It does this by providing us with very general precepts (do not steal, do not murder, etc) the point of which is to help us preserve the common good in our actions. Yet no situation requiring justice is the same, and thus our considerations of what is just must extend beyond what these general precepts dictate. We must be mindful of individual needs and judicious when applying these precepts. This is why Aquinas insists that the proximate concern of particular justice cannot be the common good but the good of individuals (Ibid.). In fulfilling its purpose, however, particular justice is a means of preserving community welfare.
Following Aristotle, Aquinas identifies two species of particular justice that deserve attention:commutative and distributive justice. Both seek to preserve equality between persons by giving to each person what is due. Yet Aquinas notes that there are “different kinds of due,” and this fact necessitates the current distinction (ST IIaIIae 61.1 ad 5; ST IIaIIae 61.2 ad 2). Commutative justice concerns the “mutual dealings” between individual citizens (ST IIaIIae 61.1). Specifically, it seeks to ensure that those who are buying and selling conduct their business fairly (In NE V.928). In this context “what is due” is a kind of equality whereby “one person should pay back to the other just so much as he has become richer out of that which belonged to the other” (ST IIaIIae 61.2). In other words, the value of a product should be equal to what one pays for that product. Similarly, a person should be paid an amount that is comparable to the value of what he sells. In short, the kind of equality commutative justice seeks to preserve is a matter of quantity (Ibid; In NE V.950).
Distributive justice concerns the way in which collective goods and responsibilities “are [fairly] apportioned among people who stand in a social community” (In NE V.927). Yet with respect to distributive justice, what a person receives is not a matter of equal quantity but “due proportion” (STIIaIIae 61.2). After all, it would be unjust if “laborers are paid equal wages for doing an unequal amount of work, or are paid unequal wages for doing an equal amount of work” (In NE V 4.935). Aquinas also thinks that a person of higher social station will require a greater proportion of goods (ST IIaIIae 61.2). In matters of distributive justice, then, “what is due” will be relative to what one deserves (or needs, since Aquinas also thinks that there is a moral obligation to provide for the poor) depending on his efforts or station in life.
This brief account of justice may seem like a stale precursor to more modern accounts of justice, particularly those that depict justice in terms of equality and economic fairness. Yet a brief survey of the virtues that hinge on justice reveals an account that is richer than the foregoing paragraphs may suggest. For Aquinas, justice is principally about our relations to others, and so he thinks that “all the virtues that are directed to another person may by reason of this common aspect be annexed to justice” (ST IIaIIae 80.1). The virtues Aquinas has in mind here are not simply those that regulate our relationships with other human beings, but with God. Thus he insists that religion is a virtue that falls under justice, since it involves offering God his due honor (Ibid; ST IIaIIae 81.1). The same can be said for piety andobservance, since they seek to render to God service and deference, respectively. Other virtues annexed to justice include truthfulness, since the just person will always present himself to others without pretext or falsehood; gratitude, which involves an appreciation for others’ kindness; and revenge, whereby we respond to or defend ourselves against others’ injurious actions (Ibid.). Finally, Aquinas includes bothliberality and friendship as parts of justice. The former is a virtue whereby we benefit others by giving or sharing with them the goods we possess (ST IIaIIae 117.1, 2, and 5). The latter involves treating those who live among us well (ST IIaIIae 114.2).
Aquinas is often described as a natural law theorist. While natural law is a significant aspect of his moral philosophy, it is a subject of considerable dispute and misunderstanding. Of course, this is not the place to adjudicate competing interpretations of Aquinas’s view. Yet recent philosophers have noted that too many expositors distort Aquinas’s view by treating it independently of his metaethics and his theory of virtue (see for example MacIntyre, 1990: 133-135; Hibbs, 2001: 94). While a detailed analysis of natural law and its varying interpretations would require a separate study, the present article hopes to sketch Aquinas’s view in a way that is sensitive to other aspects of his thought.
What is the natural law? We might attempt to answer this question by considering both the meaning of the term “law” as well as the law’s origin. On Aquinas’s view, a law is “a rule or measure of human acts, whereby a person is induced to act or is restrained from acting” (ST IaIIae 90.1). Elsewhere, he describes a law as a “dictate of practical reason emanating from a ruler” (ST IaIIae 91.1). At a very general level, then, a law is a precept that serves as a guide to and measure of human action. Thus whether an action is good will depend on whether it conforms to or abides by the relevant law. Here we should recall from an earlier section that, for Aquinas, a human action is good or bad depending on whether it conforms to reason. In other words, reason is the measure by which we evaluate human acts. Thus Aquinas thinks that the laws that govern human action are expressive of reason itself (ST IaIIae 90.1).
Now we will address the law’s origin. According to Aquinas, every law is ultimately derived from what he calls the eternal law (ST IaIIae 93.3). The “eternal law” refers to God’s providential ordering of all created things to their proper end. We participate in that divine order in virtue of the fact that God creates in us both a desire for and an ability to discern what is good (he calls this ability the “light of natural reason”). According to Aquinas, “it is this participation in the eternal law by the rational creature that is called the natural law” (ST IaIIae 91.2; Cf. 93.6). On this view, natural law is but an extension of the eternal law. For by it God ordains us to final happiness by implanting in us both a general knowledge of and inclination for goodness. Note here that the natural law is not an external source of authority. Nor is it a general deontic norm from which more specific precepts are inferred (McInerny, 1993: 211-212; Hibbs, 1988: 61-62). As Aquinas understands it, the natural law is a fundamental principle that is weaved into the fabric of our nature. As such, it illuminates and gives us a desire for those goods that facilitate the kind of flourishing proper to human beings (ST IaIIae 94.3). This point deserves further discussion.
According to Aquinas, human beings have an innate habit whereby they reason according to what he calls “first principles.” First principles are fundamental to all inquiry. They include things like the principle of non-contradiction and law of excluded middle. These principles are indemonstrable in the sense that we do not acquire them from some prior demonstration. To put the matter another way, they are not facts at which we arrive by means of argument or reasoning. They are the principles from which all reasoning proceeds. And while we do not derive them from some prior set of facts, a moment’s reflection would show that they nevertheless provide the conditions for intelligible inquiry. In short, human reasoning does not establish the truth of first principles, it depends on them.
The natural law functions in a way that is analogous to the aforementioned principles. According to Aquinas, all human actions are governed by a general principle or precept that is foundational to and necessary for all practical reasoning: good is to be done and evil is to be avoided. This principle is not something we can ignore or defy. Rather, it is an expression of how practical thought and action proceed in creatures such as ourselves. Whenever we deliberate about how we should act, we do so by virtue of a natural inclination to pursue (or avoid) those goods (or evils) that contribute to (or deter us from) our perfection as human beings. The goods for which we have a natural inclination include life, the procreation and education of offspring, knowledge, and a civil social order (ST IaIIae 94.2). Whether there are additional goods that are emblematic of the natural law will depend on whether they in fact contribute to our rational perfection.
A caveat is in order. While we naturally desire goods that facilitate our perfection, excessive passion, unreasonable fear, and self-interest can distort the way we construe those goods (ST IaIIae 94.6). For example, sexual pleasure is a natural good. Yet excessive passion can corrupt our understanding of what sex’s role ought to be in our lives and lead us to pursue short-term sexual pleasure at the expense of more enduring goods. Also, self-protection is a good to which we naturally incline. Yet unreasonable fear may deter us from acting for the sake of goods that trump personal safety. Poor upbringing and the prejudices of society can further undermine a proper view of what human fulfillment consists in. Whether we can make competent judgments about what will contribute to our proper fulfillment depends on whether we have the requisite intellectual and moral virtues. Without those virtues, our intellectual and moral deficiencies will forestall our rational perfection and the attainment of our final end.
The teleological framework that circumscribes Aquinas’s moral philosophy has been evident throughout this essay. Indeed, Aquinas takes Aristotle’s eudaimonism to be amenable to his own theological purposes. Not only does Aquinas agree that human beings seek their own happiness, he agrees that the virtues are necessary for achieving it. Yet there are important differences between Aquinas’s depiction of final happiness and Aristotle’s. While Aquinas thinks that moral perfection is synonymous with achieving our final end, he construes that end in terms of beatitude, or supernatural union with God (ST IIaIIae 17.7; 23.3; 23.7). In keeping with Christian teaching, he also acknowledges that we cannot achieve beatitude solely by means of our own virtuous efforts. Aquinas’s argument for this claim is as follows: the happiness to which we incline is of two sorts—incomplete happiness and complete happiness. Incomplete happiness is a state we achieve by means of our natural human aptitudes. Through them, we can cultivatesome measure of virtue and, in turn, be happier than we would be otherwise. Perfect or complete happiness, however, lies beyond what we are able to achieve on our own. Thus Aquinas insists that “it is necessary for man to receive from God some additional [habits], whereby he may be directed to supernatural happiness” (ST IaIIae 62.1). According to Aquinas, the habits to which he refers here are “infused” or theological virtues. They are given to us graciously by God and direct us to our “final and perfect good” in the same way that the moral virtues direct us to a kind of happiness made possible by the exercise of our natural capacities (ST IaIIae 62.3).
The theological virtues that facilitate perfect happiness are those listed by St. Paul in the second letter to the Corinthians: faith, hope, and charity. Faith is the virtue whereby we assent to the truth of supernaturally revealed principles (Aquinas calls them “articles of faith”). These articles are contained (at least implicitly) in Scripture and serve as the basis of sacred doctrine. The kind of assent Aquinas has in mind here is not a matter of the intellect alone. It also involves the will. For the will is naturally drawn to God’s goodness and commands the intellect to assent to those articles wherein that goodness is described (Stump, 1991: 188; Jenkins, 1997: 190). Thus Aquinas describes the assent of faith as “an act of intellect which assents to the divine truth at the command of the will, [which is] moved by God’s grace” (STIIaIIae 2.9). Hope is the virtue whereby we trust God in obtaining final happiness. But because God is the one in whom final happiness consists (and not simply the one who assists us in achieving it), we must look to God as the good we desire to obtain (ST IIaIIae 17.6 ad 3). Finally, charity is the virtue whereby we love God for his own sake. He amplifies this idea when he (echoing Augustine) says that charity is an appetitive state whereby our appetites are uniformly ordered to God (STIIaIIae 23.3 sed contra). We should also note here that Aquinas thinks that love of neighbor is included in the love of God. For our neighbor is the natural image of God; thus we cannot love God unless we also love our neighbor (STIIaIIae 25.1 and 44.7).
The virtue of charity is especially relevant to Aquinas’s moral philosophy. As we just discussed, our efforts to be virtuous may contribute to our general betterment, but they alone cannot bring us to final happiness (although they can aid us in this regard, as we will see shortly). In fact, Aquinas thinks that the moral virtues remain incomplete and imperfect so long as they fail to direct us to God (ST IaIIae 65.2; ST IIaIIae 23.7). Charity, on the other hand, rectifies our fallen wills; that is, it perfects our deficient inclinations by orienting them toward God as the proper source of our fulfillment.
Moreover, charity affords a supernatural benefit—or gift—that the cardinal virtues could never provide. That benefit is the gift of wisdom. The gift of wisdom should not be confused with the intellectual virtue of the same name. The virtue of wisdom is an intellectual excellence whereby one grasps the fundamental causes of the world’s origin and operation (ST IIaIIae 45.1; SCG I.1.1). Knowledge of those causes may include knowledge of God, who is the highest cause of things. Yet the virtue of wisdom cannot disclose some of the more important aspects of God’s character. By contrast, the gift of wisdom enables us to see that God is the “sovereign good, which is the last end…” (ST IIaIIae 45.1 ad 1). Those who are wise (in the second sense) have a more comprehensive grasp of God’s goodness and can therefore judge and govern human actions according to divine principles (ST IIaIIae 45.3). Understood this way, the gift of wisdom consists not only in a theoretical grasp of divine things, but it also provides one with the normative guidance necessary for ordering one’s life according to Goodness itself (Ibid.).
Charity, then, inclines one to love God, whose goodness is perfect, unchanging, and eternal. Those who seek happiness in God will be more fulfilled than if they sought happiness in some lesser, transient good. That is, they will experience spiritual joy (ST IIaIIae 28.1). They will also experience supernaturalconcord in the sense that their wills will be in harmony with God’s (ST IIaIIae 29.1). What makes this account especially interesting for our purposes is that it provides us with a more explicit understanding of the sort of fulfillment in which beatitude consists.
What connection, if any, is there between the infused virtue of charity and the moral virtues we’ve previously discussed? This is an important question. Constraints of space, however, permit us to highlight only two such connections. First, charity transforms the virtues themselves. To employ Aquinas’s parlance, charity provides the form of the virtues (ST IIaIIae 23.8). It does this by determining the end at which the virtues aim. For, “in morals, the form of an act is taken chiefly from the end” (Ibid.). Under the auspices of charity, the moral virtues still have the task of moderating our appetites. The purpose for which they do so, however, is for the sake of God. For if, as Aristotle insists “virtue is the disposition of a perfect thing to that which is best,” then even the moral virtues must in some way direct us to supernatural happiness (ST IIaIIae 23.7). The second connection is a natural extension of the first, and it helps explain why—even with charity—we need the moral virtues. According to Aquinas, it is possible for those who love God to sin against charity, especially when moved by desires or fears of an inordinate nature (ST IIaIIae 24.12.ad,2). For this reason we must practice those virtues that curtail sinful inclinations and enable us to yield to charity more easily (ST IaIIae 65.3 ad 1 and 2). In conjunction with charity, the moral virtues actually aid in our journey to final happiness and thus play an important role in our redemption.
This last point nicely reflects the way Aquinas weds Christian moral theology and Aristotelian philosophy. More generally, it exemplifies the way in which Aquinas took faith and reason to be perfectly compatible. Of course, the extent to which Aquinas was faithful to Aristotle in his grand synthesis is a subject that must be left for others to address. This matter aside, it is clear that Aquinas’s endeavor has left us with one of the richer and more enduring accounts of the moral life that philosophy has to offer.
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 23, 2006 | Originally published: