The political philosophy of Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274), along with the broader philosophical teaching of which it is part, stands at the crossroads between the Christian gospel and the Aristotelian political doctrine that was, in Aquinas’ time, newly discovered in the Western world. In fact, Aquinas’ whole developed system is often understood to be simply a modification of Aristotelian philosophy in light of the Christian gospel and with special emphasis upon those questions most relevant to Christianity, such as the nature of the divine, the human soul, and morality. This generalization would explain why Aquinas seems to eschew, even neglect, the subject of politics. Unlike his medieval Jewish and Islamic counterparts, Aquinas does not have to reconcile Aristotelianism with a concrete political and legal code specified in the sacred writings of his religion. As far as he is concerned, God no longer requires people to live according to the judicial precepts of the Old Law (Summa Theologiae [hereafter ST], I-II, 104.3), and so the question of formulating a comprehensive Christian political teaching that is faithful to biblical principles loses it urgency if not its very possibility. Unlike Judaism and Islam, Christianity does not involve specific requirements for conducting civil society. In fact, most Christians before Aquinas’ time (such as St. Augustine) had interpreted Jesus’ assertion that we should “render unto Caesar the things that are Caesar’s” (Matthew22:21) to mean that Christianity can flourish in any political regime so long as its authorities permit believers to “render unto God the things that are God’s.” Although Jesus claimed to be a king, he was quick to add that his kingdom was not of this world (John 18:36), and whereas St. Paul had exhorted Christians to obey the civil authorities and even to suffer injustice willingly, he never considered it necessary to discuss the nature of political justice itself.
These observations perhaps explain why Aquinas, whose writings nearly all come in the form of extremely well organized and systematic treatises, never completed a thematic discussion of politics. His letter On Kingship (written as a favor to the king of Cyprus) comes closest to fitting the description of a political treatise, and yet this brief and unfinished work hardly presents a comprehensive treatment of political philosophy. Even his commentary on Aristotle‘s Politics is less than half complete, and it is debatable whether this work is even intended to express Aquinas’ own political philosophy at all. This does not mean, however, that Aquinas was uninterested in political philosophy or that he simply relied on Aristotle to provide the missing political teaching that Christianity leaves out. Nor does it mean that Aquinas does not have a political teaching. Although it is not expressed in overtly political works, Aquinas’ thoughts on political philosophy may be found within treatises that contain discussions of issues with far reaching political implications. In his celebrated Summa Theologiae, for instance, Aquinas engages in long discussions of law, the virtue of justice, the common good, economics, and the basis of morality. Even though not presented in the context of a comprehensive political teaching, these texts provide a crucial insight into Aquinas’ understanding of politics and the place of political philosophy within his thought.
Aquinas’ celebrated doctrine of natural law no doubt plays a central role in his moral and political teaching. According to Aquinas, everything in the terrestrial world is created by God and endowed with a certain nature that defines what each sort of being is in its essence. A thing’s nature is detectable not only in its external appearance, but also and more importantly through the natural inclinations which guide it to behave in conformity with the particular nature it has. As Aquinas argues, God’s authorship and active role in prescribing and sustaining the various natures included in creation may rightfully be called a law. After defining law as “an ordinance of reason for the common good, made by someone who has care of the community, and promulgated.” (ST, I-II, 90.4), Aquinas explains that the entire universe is governed by the supreme lawgiver par excellence: “Granted that the world is ruled by Divine Providence…the whole community of the universe is governed by Divine Reason.” (ST, I-II, 91.1). Even though the world governed by God’s providence is temporal and limited, Aquinas calls the law that governs it the “eternal law.” Its eternal nature comes not from that to which it applies, but rather from whom the law is derived, namely, God. As Aquinas explains, “the very idea of the government of things in God the Ruler of the universe, has the nature of a law. And since Divine Reason’s conception of things is not subject to time but is eternal, according to Prov. viii, 23…this kind of law must be called eternal.” (Ibid.).
In the vast majority of cases, God governs his subjects through the eternal law without any possibility that that law might be disobeyed. This, of course, is because most beings in the universe (or at least in the natural world) do not possess the rational ability to act consciously in a way that is contrary to the eternal law implanted in them. Completely unique among natural things, however, are humans who, although completely subject to divine providence and the eternal law, possess the power of free choice and therefore have a radically different relation to that law. As Aquinas explains, “among all others, the rational creature is subject to Divine Providence in the most excellent way, in so far as it partakes of a share of providence, by being provident both for itself, and for others. Wherefore, it has a share of the Eternal Reason, whereby it has a natural inclination to its proper act and end.” (ST, I-II, 91.2). Because the rational creature’s relation to the eternal law is so different from that of any other created thing, Aquinas prefers to call the law that governs it by a different name. Instead of saying that humans are under the eternal law, therefore, he says they are under the natural law, and yet “the natural law is nothing else than the rational creature’s participation of the eternal law” (Ibid.). Another, equally accurate, way of stating Aquinas’ position is that the natural law is the eternal law as it applies to human beings.
As the “rule and measure” of human behavior, the natural law provides the only possible basis for morality and politics. Simply stated, the natural law guides human beings through their fundamental inclinations toward the natural perfection that God, the author of the natural law, intends for them. As we have seen, however, the human subjugation to the eternal law (called the natural law) is always concomitant with a certain awareness the human subject has of the law binding him. This awareness is crucial in Aquinas’ view. Since one of the essential components of law is to be promulgated, the natural law would lose its legal character if human beings did not have the principles of that law instilled in their minds (ST, I-II, 90.4 ad 1). For this reason Aquinas considers the natural law to be a habit, not in itself, but because the principles (or precepts) of the natural law are naturally held in our minds by means of an intellectual habit, which Aquinas calls synderesis. Synderisis denotes a natural knowledge held by all people instructing them as to the fundamental moral requirements of their human nature. As Aquinas explains, just as speculative knowledge requires there to be certain principles from which one can draw further conclusions, so also practical and moral knowledge presupposes an understanding of fundamental practical precepts from which more concrete moral directives may be derived. Whereas Aquinas calls the habit by which human beings understand the first moral principles (which are also the first principles of the natural law) synderesis (ST, Ia, 79.12), he calls the act by which one applies that understanding to concrete situations conscience (ST, Ia, 79.13). Therefore, by means of synderesis a man would know that the act of adultery is morally wrong and contrary to the natural law. By an act of conscience he would reason that intercourse with this particular woman that is not his wife is an act of adultery and should therefore be avoided. Thus understood, the natural law includes principles that are universally accessible regardless of time, place, or culture. In Aquinas’ words, it is the same in all humans (ST, I-II, 94.4), unchangeable (ST, I-II, 94.5), and cannot be abolished from the hearts of men (ST, I-II, 94.6). It is in light of this teaching that Aquinas interprets St. Paul’s argument that the “Gentiles who have not the law do by nature what the law requires, they are a law to themselves, even though they do not have the law. They show that what the law requires is written on their hearts.” (Romans 2:14-16).
How are the precepts of the natural law derived? According to Aquinas, the very first precept is that “good is to be done and pursued and evil is to be avoided.” (ST, I-II, 94.2). As he explains, this principle serves the practical reason just as the principle of non-contradiction serves the speculative reason. Just as the speculative intellect naturally apprehends the fact that “the same thing cannot be affirmed and denied at the same time,” the practical intellect apprehends that good is to be pursued and evil is to be avoided. By definition, neither the first principle of speculative nor practical reason can be demonstrated. Rather, they are principles without which human reasoning cannot coherently draw any conclusions whatsoever. Otherwise stated, they are first principles inasmuch as they are not derived from any prior practical or speculative knowledge. Still, they are just as surely known as any other knowledge obtained through demonstrative reasoning. In fact, they are naturally known and self-evident for the very same reason that they are not subject to demonstration. This is important from Aquinas’ perspective because all practical knowledge (including the moral and political sciences) must rest upon certain principles before any valid conclusions are drawn. To return to the above example, a man who recognizes the evil of adultery will only know that this act of adultery must be avoided if he first understands the more fundamental precept that evil ought to be avoided in general. No one can prove this general principle to him. He simply understands it by the habit of synderesis.
Aquinas would be the first to recognize, of course, that the simple requirements of doing good and avoiding evil fail to provide human beings with much content for pursuing the moral life. How, one must ask, do we know what things actually are good and evil? In response to this Aquinas argues that human beings must consult their natural inclinations. Beyond the mere knowledge that good is to be pursued and evil avoided our natural inclinations are the most fundamental guide to understanding where the natural law is directing us. In other words, our natural inclinations reveal to us what the most fundamental human goods are. As Aquinas explains, man first has natural inclinations “in accordance with the nature he has in common with all substances…such as preserving human life and warding off its obstacles.” Secondly, there are inclinations we have in common with other animals, such as “sexual intercourse,” the “education of offspring and so forth.” And finally there are inclinations specific to man’s rational nature, such as the inclination to “know the truth about God,” to “shun ignorance,” and to “live in society.” (Ibid.). It may seem strange that Aquinas would list the pursuit of “sexual intercourse” as one of the natural inclinations supporting and defining the natural law. To be sure, Aquinas recognizes that all the aforementioned inclinations are subject to the corruption of our sinful nature. It is not morally good, therefore, simply to act on an inclination. One must first recognize the natural purpose of a given inclination and only act upon it insofar as that purpose is respected. This is why Aquinas is quick to add that all inclinations belong to the natural law only insofar as they are “ruled by reason.” (ST, I-II, 94.2, ad 2). As someone is inclined to sexual intercourse, for instance, he must also recognize that this natural good must be pursued only within a certain context (that is, within marriage, open to the possibility of procreation, etc.). If this natural order of reason is ignored, any natural good (even knowledge [ST, II-II, 167]) can be pursued in an inappropriate way that is actually contrary to the natural law.
As we have seen, Aquinas mentions that one of the natural goods to which human beings are inclined is “to live in society.” This remark presents the ideal point of departure for one of the most important teachings of Thomistic political philosophy, namely, the political nature of man. This doctrine is taken primarily from the first book of Aristotle’s Politics upon which Aquinas wrote an extensive commentary (although the commentary is only completed through book 3, chapter 8 of Aristotle’s Politics, Aquinas seems to have commented upon what he considered to be the Politics’ theoretical core.). Following “the Philosopher” Aquinas believes that political society (civitas) emerges from the needs and aspirations of human nature itself. Thus understood, it is not an invention of human ingenuity (as in the political teachings of modern social contract theorists) nor an artificial construction designed to make up for human nature’s shortcomings. It is, rather, a prompting of nature itself that sets humans apart from all other natural creatures. To be sure, political society is not simply given by nature. It is rather something to which human beings naturally aspire and which is necessary for the full perfection of their existence. The capacity for political society is not natural to man, therefore, in the same way as the five senses are natural. The naturalness of politics is more appropriately compared to the naturalness of moral virtue (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 ). Even though human beings are inclined to moral virtue, acquiring the virtues nonetheless requires both education and habituation. In the same way, even though human beings are inclined to live in political societies, such societies must still be established, built, and maintained by human industry. To be fully human is to live in political society, and Aquinas makes a great deal of Aristotle’s claim that one who is separated from society so as to be completely a-political must be either sub-human or super-human, either a “beast or a god.” (Aristotle’s Politics, 1253a27; Cf. Aquinas’Commentary, Book 1, Lesson 1 ).
Aquinas admits, of course, that political society is not the only natural community. The family is natural in perhaps an even stronger sense and is prior to political society. The priority of the family, however, is not a priority of importance, since politics aims at a higher and nobler good than the family. It is rather a priority of development. In other words, politics surpasses all other communities in dignity while at the same time depending upon and presupposing the family. On this point Aquinas follows Aristotle’s explanation of how political society develops from other lower societies including both the family and the village. The human family comes into existence from the nearly universal tendency of males and females joining together for purposes of procreation. Humans share with other animals (and even plants) a “natural appetite to leave after them another being like themselves,” (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 ) and immediately see the utility if not the necessity of both parents remaining available to provide for the needs of the children and one another. As families grow in size and number there also seems to be a tendency for them to gravitate towards one another and form villages. The reasons for this are primarily utilitarian. Whereas the household suffices for providing the daily necessities of life, the village is necessary for providing non-daily commodities (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 ). What Aquinas and Aristotle seem to have in mind in describing the emergence of the village is the division of labor. Whereas humans can reproduce and survive quite easily in families, life becomes much more productive and affluent when families come together in villages, since one man can now specialize in a certain task while fulfilling his family’s remaining material needs through barter and trade.
Despite the village’s usefulness to man, it nevertheless leaves him incomplete. This is partly because the village is still relatively small and so the effectiveness of the division of labor remains limited. Much more useful is the conglomeration of several villages, which provides a wider variety of commodities and specializations to be shared by means of exchange (Commentary on the Politics Book 1, Lesson 1 ). This is one reason why the village is eclipsed by political society, which proves much more useful to human beings because of its greater size and much more elaborate governmental structure. There is, however, a far more important reason why political society comes into existence. In addition to yielding greater protection and economic benefits, it also enhances the moral and intellectual lives of human beings. By identifying with a political community, human beings begin to see the world in broader terms than the mere satisfaction of their bodily desires and physical needs. Whereas the residents of the village better serve their individual interests, the goal of the political community becomes the good of the whole, or the common good, which Aquinas claims (following Aristotle) is “better and more divine than the good of the individual.” (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 ). The political community is thus understood as the first community (larger than the family) for which the individual makes great sacrifices, since it is not merely a larger cooperative venture for mutual economic benefit. It is, rather, the social setting in which man truly finds his highest natural fulfillment. In this sense, the political community, even though not directed to the individual good, better serves the individual by promoting a life of virtue in which human existence can be greatly ennobled. It is in this context that Aquinas argues (again following Aristotle) that although political society originally comes into being for the sake of living, it exists for the sake of “living well.” (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lesson 1 ).
Aquinas takes Aristotle’s argument that political society transcends the village and completes human social existence to prove that the city is natural. Similar, but not identical, to this claim is Aquinas’ further assertion that man is by nature a “civic and social animal.” (ST, I-II, 72.4). To support this, Aquinas refers us to Aristotle’s observation that human beings are the only animals possessing the ability to exercise speech. Not to be confused with mere voice (vox), speech (loquutio) involves the communication of thoughts and concepts between persons (ST, I-II, 72.4). Whereas voice is found in many different animals that communicate their immediate desires and aversions to one another (seen in the dog’s bark and the lion’s roar) speech includes a conscious conception of what one is saying (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 ). By means of speech, therefore, human beings may collectively deliberate on core civic matters regarding “what is useful and what is harmful,” as well as “the just and the unjust.” (Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 ). Whereas other animals exhibit a certain social tendency (as bees instinctively work to preserve their hive), only humans are social in the sense that they cooperate through speech to pursue a common understanding of justice, virtue, and the good. Since speech is the outward expression of his inner rationality, man is political by nature for the same reason he is naturally rational.
The fact that man is a naturally political animal has far-reaching implications. In addition to being a father, a mother, a farmer, or a teacher, a human being is more importantly identified as a citizen. Achieving genuine human excellence, therefore, most always means achieving excellence as a citizen of some political society (Aquinas does mention the possibility that someone’s supernatural calling may necessitate that they live outside of political society. As examples of such people, he mentions “John the Baptist and Blessed Anthony the hermit.” See his Commentary on the Politics, Book 1, Lecture 1 .). To be sure, the requirements of good citizenship vary from regime to regime, but more generally conceived the good citizen is the one that places the common good above his own private good and acts accordingly. In doing so, such a person exhibits the virtue of legal justice whereby all of his actions are referred in one way or another to the common good of his particular society (ST, II-II, 58.5). Following the progression of Aristotle’s discussion of citizenship, however, Aquinas recognizes a certain difficulty in assigning an unqualifiedly high value to citizenship. What sense does it make to speak of a good citizen in a bad regime? One does not need to consider the worst sorts of regimes to see the difficulty inherent in achieving good citizenship. In any regime that is less than perfect there always remains the possibility that promoting the interests of the regime and promoting the common good may not be the same. To be sure, good men are often called to stand up heroically against tyrants (ST, II-II, 42.2, ad 3), but the full potential of the good citizen will never be realized unless he lives in best of all possible regimes. In other words, only in the best regime do the good citizen and the good human being coincide (Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 3 ). In fact, even the best regime will fall short of producing a multitude of good citizens, since no society exists where everyone is virtuous (Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 3 ).
But what is the best regime? Following Aristotle, Aquinas argues that all regimes can be divided into six basic types, which are determined according to two criteria: how the regime is ruled and whether or not it is ruled justly (that is, for the common good). As he explains, political rule may be exercised by the multitude, by a select few, or by one person. If the regime is ruled justly, it is called a monarchy or kingship when ruled by one single individual, an aristocracy when ruled by a few, and a polity or republic when ruled by the multitude. If, on the other hand, a regime is ruled unjustly (that is, for the sake of the ruler(s) and not for the common weal), it is called a tyranny when ruled by one, an oligarchy when ruled by a few, and a democracy when ruled by the multitude (On Kingship, Book 1, Chapter 1;Commentary on the Politics, Book 3, Lecture 6 [393-394]). Simply Stated, the best regime is monarchy. Aquinas’ argument for this is drawn from a mixture of philosophical and theological observations. Inasmuch as the goal of any ruler should be the “unity of peace,” the regime is better governed by one person rather than by many. For this end is much more efficaciously secured by a single wise authority who is not burdened by having to deliberate with others who may be less wise and who may stand in the way of effective governance. As Aquinas observes in his letter On Kingship, any governing body comprised of many must always strive to act as one in order to move the regime closer to the intended goal. In this sense, therefore, the less perfect regimes tend to imitate monarchy in which unanimity of rule is realized at once and without obstruction (On Kingship, Book 1, Chapter 2). This conclusion is confirmed by the example of nature, which always “does what is best.” For the many powers of the human soul are governed by a single power, i.e., reason. A hive of bees is ruled by a single bee, i.e., the queen. And most convincingly of all, the universe is governed by the single authority of God, “Maker and Ruler of all things.” As art is called to imitate nature, human society is therefore best that is governed by a single authority of a eminently wise and just monarch who resembles God as much as humanly possible.
Aquinas is well aware, of course, that such a monarch is not always available in political societies, and even where he is available it is not always guaranteed that the conditions will be right to grant him the political authority he ought to wield. Even worse, there is always the danger that the monarch will be corrupted and become a tyrant. In this case the best of all regimes has the greatest tendency to become the worst. This is why, whereas monarchy is the best regime simply speaking, it is not always the best regime in a particular time and place, which is to say it is certainly not always the best possible regime. Therefore, Aquinas outlines in the Summa Theologiae a more modest proposal whereby political rule is somewhat decentralized. The regime that he recommends takes the positive dimensions of all three “good regimes.” Whereas it has a monarch at its head, it is also governed by “others” possessing a certain degree of authority who may advise the monarch while curbing any tyrannical tendencies he may have. Finally, Aquinas suggests that the entire multitude of citizens should be responsible for selecting the monarch and should all be candidates for political authority themselves. Whereas the best regime simply speaking is monarchy, the best possible regime seems to be the mixed government that incorporates the positive dimensions of monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy (In the Summa Theologiae, Aquinas appears to use the name of democracy in place of Aristotle’s conception of polity.). To support this conclusion, Aquinas is able to cite the Hebrew form of government established by God in the Old Testament. Whereas Moses (and his successors) ruled the Jews as a monarch, there also existed a council of seventy-two elders which provided “an element of aristocracy.” Inasmuch as the rulers were selected from among the people, this sacred regime of the Bible also incorporated a certain dimension of democracy (ST, I-II, 105.1).
The fact that regimes may vary according to time and place is a perfect example of the fact that not every moral or political directive is specified by nature. In fact, Aquinas is eager to point out that the natural law, while providing the fundamental basis for human action and politics, fails to provide specific requirements for all the details of human social existence. For example, whereas the natural law does provide certain general standards of economic justice (which we shall consider later on), it does not give a preferred form of currency. There is no natural law that requires how often public roads should be repaired, or whether military service will be mandatory or voluntary. Whereas Aquinas argues that the natural law requires criminals to be punished for injustices such as murder, theft, and assault, there is no natural specification as to precisely what kinds of punishments ought to be imposed for these crimes. Even though, as Aquinas recognizes, these details do not pertain directly to whether a regime is good or bad, human social life would be impossible to maintain without attention to such detail. Such is the role, according to Aquinas, of human law (ST, I-II, 91.3).
This is not to suggest, of course, that human laws only concern those matters which may just as easily be decided one way or another. Within a particular socio-political context, it may indeed be a terrible mistake to make military service compulsory or in another context to punish treason with leniency, even though the natural law does not specify which situations call for which measures. Additionally, human law is necessary to enforce the moral and political requirements of the natural law that may go unheeded. Even though the precepts of the natural law are available to human reason when it considers matters rightly, not all human beings use their practical reason to its fullest capacity and some act maliciously even when they happen to know better. And because the natural law does not simply enforce itself, the basic requirements of justice must be bolstered by an organized and civilized human authority (ST, I-II, 95.1). Accordingly, human laws serve two purposes. First, they provide the missing details that the natural law leaves out due to its generality. Secondly, they compel those under the law to observe those standards of justice and morality even about which the natural law does specify. This second function of human law leads Aquinas to a crucial distinction. After asking whether human laws are derived from the natural law, he argues that, although all human laws are derived from the natural law in a certain sense, some are more directly derived than others. The distinction he invokes is that between human laws which constitute “conclusions” from principles of natural law and those which constitute “determinations” from the natural law. Human laws are considered conclusions from the natural law when they pertain to those matters about which the natural law offers a clear precept. To use Aquinas’ own example, “that one must not kill may be derived as a conclusion from the principle that one should do harm to no man.” (ST, I-II, 95.2). Thus, human laws must include prohibitions against murder, assault, and the like even though such actions are already prohibited by the natural law. At the same time, however, the natural law does not specify exactly how a murderer must be punished, whether (for example) by means of banishment, the death penalty, or imprisonment. Such details depend upon a number of factors that prudent legislators and judges must take into consideration apart from their understanding of the general principles of natural justice. According to Aquinas, those dictates of natural reason which human beings should recognize as directly pertaining to the natural law, and which are therefore common principles of human law in many different regimes, are embodied in something called the “law of nations” [ius gentium]. Strictly speaking, the law of nations is a human law derived as a set of conclusions from the natural law. On the other hand, the law of nations is not the law of any particular regime and for this reason is sometimes equated with the natural law itself. For Aquinas’ treatment of the law of nations (see ST, I-II, 95.4 and ST, II-II, 57.3). Such details are the bases of human laws that Aquinas calls determinations from the natural law. It is important to note that both conclusions and determinations are based on the natural law in some way, for the question of how a murderer or a thief ought to be punished would be meaningless without the more general requirement (found in the natural law itself) that injustice must be met with a punishment that in some way fits the crime. To consider the matter by way of analogy, we may take note of Aquinas’ own example in the Summa Theologiae. As he explains, legislators rely upon their understanding of the natural law in the same way that craftsmen must use the “general form of a house” before they build a particular house to which many architectural details may be added (ST, I-II, 95.2). To press the analogy further, just as all houses must be built according to certain general principles (e.g., all houses must have a roof, a foundation, windows, at least one door, etc.), so also all political regimes must enforce certain human laws as conclusions from the natural law (e.g., prohibitions against murder, theft, adultery, and assault). In the same way, just as a house under construction may exhibit a wide array of details not belonging to the “general form” of a house (e.g., some houses have a brick foundation and some are on a concrete slab, some are heated with oil and some with natural gas, etc.), so also political regimes may vary according to similarly non-essential details that Aquinas would call determinations of the natural law (e.g., determining specific punishments for specific crimes).
In Aquinas’ view, human laws are essential for the maintenance of any organized and civilized society. At the same time, however, Aquinas understands human laws to be somewhat limited in scope. Several passages in the Summa Theologiae testify to this, including Aquinas’ comparison between human law and divine law. As he explains, the very reason why divine law is necessary pertains directly to those areas where human law (and even natural law) fall short. The most obvious example of this is the simple fact that human laws may be in error. Regardless of whether they are intended to be conclusions or determinations of the natural law, human laws are made by fallible human beings and may often tend to hinder the common good rather than promote it. Secondly, Aquinas argues that, given certain circumstances, some human laws may simply fail to apply. This does not necessarily mean that such laws are unjust or even erroneously enacted. Aquinas suggests, rather, that there sometimes arise situations in which securing the common good requires actions that violate the letter of the law. For example, a law that requires the city gates to remain closed during certain times may need to be broken to allow citizens to enter as they are pursued by enemy forces (ST, I-II, 96.6; II-II, 120.1). Thirdly, Aquinas explains that human law is unable to direct the interior acts of a man’s soul. As a result, human law has a difficult time directing people toward the path of virtue, since genuine human goodness depends not only on external actions but upon interior movements of the soul, which are hidden. This is not to say that the coercive power of human law may not play some role in leading people to virtue, or even that virtue should not be an express goal of human law (that virtue is an express goal of human law, see ST, I-II, 92.1, 95.1.). It only means that the power of human law is limited by the fallible intellects of the human beings who enforce it and who only see a person’s external actions. Finally, human law is unable to “punish or forbid all evil deeds.” (ST, I-II, 91.4). By this Aquinas means that human laws must concentrate upon hindering those sorts of behaviors that are most damaging to the commonwealth. Aquinas elaborates upon this by saying that the political community would “do away with many good things” if it attempted to forbid all vices and punish every act that is judged to be immoral. Thus understood, human legislators must remember that most of their subjects need to be governed in relation to their limited capacity for virtue. As a result, “human laws do not forbid all vices, from which the virtuous abstain, but only the more grievous vices, from which it is possible for the majority to abstain; and chiefly those that are to the hurt of others, without the prohibition of which human society could not be maintained: thus human law prohibits murder, theft, and suchlike.” (ST, I-II, 96.2).
As we have seen, Aquinas’ argument for the necessity of human law includes the observation that some human beings require an additional coercive incentive to respect and promote the common good. By means of the law, those who show hostility to their fellow citizens are restrained from their evildoing through “force and fear,” and may even eventually come “to do willingly what hitherto they did from fear, and become virtuous.” (ST, I-II, 95.1). During this discussion, Aquinas mentions two specific dimensions of the common good that are of particular concern to human legislation. The first of these is “peace.” By this term (pax), Aquinas means something considerably more mundane than any sort of “inner peace” or spiritual tranquility that one finds as a result of moral or intellectual perfection. Instead, he seems to have in mind the requirements for maintaining a social order in which citizens are free from the aggression of wrongdoers and other preventable threats to safety or livelihood. In addition to preserving social order at its most basic level, however, Aquinas also makes clear in the above passage that human law should strive to instill “virtue,” and specifically that kind of virtue which has to do with the common good of society. In other words, human law is interested in instilling virtues insofar as those virtues perfect human beings in their dealings with fellow citizens and the broader community as a whole. Later in the Summa Theologiae, Aquinas calls this kind of virtue “legal justice.” (ST, II-II.58.5-6; Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 2).
According to Aquinas, legal justice is the political virtue par excellence. Contrary to what its name appears to signify, this virtue does not imply simple obedience to the law. It means, rather, an inner disposition of the human will by which those possessing it refer all their actions to the common good (Aquinas follows Aristotle in calling it “legal” justice because the law, too, has the common good as its proper object. See his Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 2 ). Thus understood, Aquinas (again following Aristotle) considers it to be a “general virtue.” By this he means that legal justice embraces any act of virtue whatsoever, so long as the agent refers his action to legal justice’s proper object. To use Aquinas’ example, fortitude is normally considered to be a virtue distinct from justice, since fortitude deals with the perfection of the irascible appetite and a person’s ability to overcome fear, whereas justice deals with the perfection of the will and a person’s dealings with others. However, a particular act of fortitude may be referred to the common good as its object and thus become an act of justice as well. For example, a soldier who rushes into battle displays fortitude by overcoming his fear of death, but he also displays justice if he is motivated by a love for the common good of the society he protects. Considered specifically, his action is courageous. Considered generally, it is an act of justice. As Aquinas explains, “the good of any virtue, whether such virtue direct man in relation to himself, or in relation to certain other individual persons, is referable to the common good, to which justice directs: so that all acts of virtue can pertain to justice, insofar as it directs man to the common good.” (ST, II-II, 58.5).
In addition to considering justice generally, however, Aquinas also considers it as a particular virtue of its own. This seems to explain why he mentions in a later discussion of human legislation that the law should promote justice in addition to peace and virtue (ST, I-II, 96.3). Regardless of the fact that justice is a virtue that legislators would like to instill within their citizens, the law also seeks to preserve justice as a certain kind of fairness. This becomes clearer when one considers Aquinas’ discussion of “right” (ius), which he characterizes as the object of justice considered as a particular virtue, and which must be safeguarded by the law regardless of whether legislators have succeeded in implanting the virtue of justice in the souls of their citizens. Strictly speaking, ius is understood by Aquinas as synonymous withiustum, or that which is just in a particular situation (ST, II-II, 57.1). Aside from making their citizens just by cultivating in them the “perpetual and constant will to render to each one his right [ius],” (ST, II-II, 58.1) legislators and judges ensure that the ius of particular situations between individuals is established or restored, that each person receives what is “due” to him such that a certain equality is maintained among citizens. When a judge orders a person to pay $100 to another for a service rendered, for example, that judge reestablishes the equality of their relationship before the service was performed. In such a case, the $100 owed to the provider of the service is his ius, which must be returned if justice in this case is to be accomplished. Again, this is not a sense of justice according to which the one paying his debt necessarily exhibits the virtue of justice, but in the sense that his actions (proceeding from any motivation whatsoever) reestablish that certain equality which can only be restored if the one who owes renders no more and no less of his debt to the one who is owed. To exhibit the virtue of justice, therefore, is much more than to perform an action that reestablishes the equality of justice or renders to someone his ius, and yet without the notion of ius, Aquinas’ concept of justice as a virtue would be unintelligible. This is why the concept of ius lies especially at the core of that part of justice which Aquinas characterizes as “particular.” In contrast to the general virtue of legal justice, which directs the acts of the other specific virtues to the common good, particular justice always includes some person or group who owes some sort of identifiable debt to another.
In explaining the details of particular justice, Aquinas further distinguishes between commutative justice and distributive justice. The example above involving one person owing $100 to another for a service rendered would be an example of commutative justice, because it involves one private individual’s debt to another private individual. It may happen, however, that something is owed to a person by the community as a whole. In this case the community distributes things according to what each individual deserves. An example of this sort of debt would be found in the realm of punitive justice. Since the punishment of criminals is not a matter pertaining to private citizens, but society as a whole (ST, I-II, 92.2 ad 3), a political community owes a certain amount of punishment that must be inflicted upon a criminal if the equality of justice is to be restored. The degree of punishment, furthermore, constitutes the ius of the particular situation. Therefore, just as in matters of exchange, where it would be unjust to fall short of or exceed the ius between buyers and sellers, it would likewise be unjust for a society to punish more or less than the criminal deserves. In addition to punishment, a political society may distribute such things as wealth, honor, material necessities, or work. As Aquinas explains, however, distributive justice seldom requires that society render an equal amount (good or bad) to its members. Following Aristotle’s teaching in the Nicomachean Ethics, Aquinas argues that the ius of distributive justice must be calculated according to a “geometrical proportion.” By this he simply means that more should be given to those who deserve more and less to those who deserve less. To return to the example of punishment, it would be gravely unfair to punish a murderer with the same penalty as a shoplifter. The equality that justice requires must be considered proportionally in the sense that greater punishments for greater crimes (and lesser punishments for lesser crimes) do in fact constitute equal treatment (Summa Contra Gentiles, III.142 ). Such is not the case in matters of commutative justice such as buying and selling, which Aquinas says must follow an “arithmetic proportion.” By this Aquinas simply means that the good or service provided must be proportional to the value of the currency or commodity for which it is exchanged (ST, II-II, 61.2;Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, Book 5, Lecture 5).
To observe how this teaching is applied to particular situations in the political community, it is helpful to consider Aquinas’ famous discussion of usury. Usury inherently constitutes a violation of commutative justice, according to Aquinas, because it creates an unfair inequality among those private individuals in society. Aquinas’ logic is extremely straightforward. If I lend someone $1000 there exists a $1000 disparity in his favor. The fact that he owes me this sum of money means that there now exists a ius that obliges him to pay me back the money he borrowed. If, however, I charge him a 10 percent fee for the use of the money lent, I require him to pay back $100 more than he originally borrowed. According to Aquinas, by doing this I would be charging him $100 more than what I am entitled to receive. Since he only borrowed $1000, he should only have to pay me back $1000.
Aquinas’ condemnation of usury has little to do with the idea that money should only be lent from the motive of generosity (even if this happens to be a consequence). It is, rather, based on his notion of the nature of money itself. Contrary to most modern economic theories, Aquinas understands money to be nothing more than a medium for exchanging commodities and thus subject to the requirements of commutative justice. Any use of money beyond this purpose distorts its original function. If money can ever be considered a commodity in its own right, it should be compared to those commodities whose use “consists in their consumption.” (ST, II-II, 78.1). Its exchange value is more akin to something like food or wine than to a house or a tool. When someone lends his house to be used, it makes perfect sense to charge rent and also to repossess the house when the allotted time for renting has expired. On the other hand, it would be quite unreasonable for a grocer to charge a fee for his food and then additionally to demand the food back after it is used. As Aquinas explains, the exchange value of money should be considered more like food than a house: “Now money, according to the Philosopher, was invented chiefly for the purpose of exchange: and consequently the proper and principal use of money is consumption or alienation whereby it is sunk in exchange. Hence it is by its very nature unlawful to take payment for the use of money lent.” (It is necessary to add that Aquinas does allow lenders to require an additional fee under two conditions. The first would be if money is lent to someone entering a business venture in which the lender shares some of the risk [periculum]. If, for example, I lend someone $1000 to invest in renting a vineyard, I am entitled to a share in his profits so long as I also agree to lose some or all of my money if the investment yields a net loss [ST, II-II, 78.2, ad 5]. Secondly, I may charge an additional fee for money lent if lending causes me to suffer some loss that I would have otherwise avoided. For example, if my loan of $1000 to a friend in need prevents me from paying my rent and thus incurring a $100 late fee, I may justly demand $1100 in return to cover my losses [ST, II-II, 78.2, ad 1]). Again, Aquinas condemns usury because it exceeds the ius that justice requires to exist between individuals. The same injustice would exist if one were to take advantage of a buyer’s desperation by selling a product for more than its value or to take advantage of a seller’s desperation by buying something for less than its value (ST, II-II, 77.1). In either case someone falls short of or exceeds the ius of a given situation, which is inherently contrary the equality that justice requires.
As we have seen, much of Aquinas’ political teaching is adapted from the Aristotelian political science which he studied in great detail and which he largely embraced. Perhaps the most central Aristotelian political doctrine in Aquinas’ view is the inherent goodness and naturalness of political society. It is also necessary to understand, however, that in addition to being good and natural political society is also limited in several important respects, not all of which would have been pointed out by Aristotle but are unique to Aquinas’ teaching. As we have already seen, Aquinas believes that the human laws governing political societies must be somewhat limited in scope. For example, the fact that something like the practice of usury is unjust does not necessarily mean that political society can or should forbid it: “Human laws leave certain things unpunished, on account of the condition of those who are imperfect, and who would be deprived of many advantages, if all sins were strictly forbidden and punishments appointed for them.” (ST, II-II, 78.1 ad 3). In this argument, Aquinas is making the simple point that human law is incapable of regulating every dimension of social life. Perhaps he would elaborate that attempting to police the practice of usury may in some cases hinder a society’s ability to prevent more serious crimes like murder, assault, and robbery (ST, I-II, 96.2). This is due to the limited nature of human law and political society itself and is one of the reasons why God has wisely chosen to apply his own divine law to human affairs. In addition to its infallibility and the fact that it applies to the “interior movements” of man’s soul, divine law is able to punish all vices while demanding the moral perfection from humans that God expects (ST, I-II, 91.4). Human law, on the other hand, must often settle for preventing only those things that imperil the immediate safety of those protected by it. This is not to say that human law does not also look to promote virtue, but the virtues it succeeds in instilling seldom fulfill the full moral capabilities of human citizens.
Secondly, Aquinas’ definition of natural law as the human participation in the eternal law also indicates something emphatically trans-political about human nature that cannot be found in the Aristotelian doctrine to which Aquinas largely adapted his own. Whereas Aristotle had argued for the existence of a natural standard of morality, he never suggested an overarching human community with a supreme lawgiver, and yet this is precisely what Aquinas’ teaching explicitly affirms (ST, I-II, 91.1-2). Not only is the natural law a universally binding law for all humans in all places (something that Aristotle never recognized), it also points to the existence of a God that consciously and providently governs human affairs as a whole (also something absent from the Aristotelian teaching). Without such divine origins, the natural law would lose its legal character, since under Aquinas’ own definition there can be no law that does not derive from someone who “has care of the community.” (ST, I-II, 90.3-4) Hence the very existence of natural law implies a more universal community under God that transcends political society. This is also apparent by looking at the epistemological basis of Aquinas’ natural law theory. As we have seen, human beings know the precepts of the natural law by a natural habit Aquinas calls synderesis. Whereas these precepts may be reinforced by the political community, they are first promulgated by nature itself and instilled in man’s mind by the hand of God. They owe nothing, therefore, to political society for their content. This is considerably different from the Aristotelian doctrine that includes no teaching regarding the self-evident first principles of natural morality upon which Aquinas’ natural law theory stands or falls and that seems to suggest (contrary to Aquinas’ view) that no universally binding law even exists that is not somewhat subject to change from regime to regime (Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b33). This difference points out in a particularly striking way the un-Aristotelian character of Aquinas’ insistence that all regimes, whether they realize it or not, are under God’s supreme authority and owe the binding force of their laws to the more fundamental natural law of which God is the sole author.
Finally, political society as Aquinas understands it is limited in an even further sense. We may observe this by returning to Aquinas’ claim that political society is natural. In one sense, of course, this affirmation of Aristotle’s teaching constitutes a very high exaltation of the political. Only by living in political society is man capable of achieving his full natural potential. Thus understood politics is no mere instrumental good (as in the teachings of modern political thinkers such as Hobbes and Locke), but is part of the very fabric of the human person, and thus the individual’s participation in political society is a great intrinsic good for the individual as well as for society. On the other hand, the characterization of politics as natural also means for Aquinas that it falls short of man’s ultimate supernatural end. For this reason Aquinas never ceases to remind us that, although politics is natural to man and constitutes an important aspect of the natural law, “man is not ordained to the body politic according to all that he is and has.” (ST, I-II, 21.4 ad 3). By this Aquinas means that beyond the fulfillment of the natural law, the active participation in political society, and even the exercise of the moral virtues, human beings find their complete perfection and happiness only in beatitude—the supernatural end to which they are called. Of course, beatitude is only fully completed in the afterlife (ST, I-II, 5.3), but even in his terrestrial existence man is called upon to exercise a supernatural perfection made possible through his active cooperation with God’s grace. Precisely because it is a natural institution, political society is not equipped to guide human beings toward the attainment of this higher supernatural vocation. In this respect it must yield to the Church, which (unlike political society) is divinely established and primarily concerned with the distribution of divine grace and the salvation of souls (On Kingship, Book I, Chapters 14-15). Again, to say that political society is merely natural is not to suggest that it should only concern man’s basic natural needs such as food, shelter, and safety. The common good that political authorities pursue includes the maintenance of a just society where individual citizens may flourish physically as well as morally. Politics thus promotes the natural virtues (most of all justice), which are themselves the human soul’s preparation for the reception of divine grace and the infusion of the supernatural virtues of faith, hope, and, above all, charity. The best one can hope from political society is that citizens will be well disposed to receive the grace available to them through the Church, which transcends politics both in its universality as well as in the finality of its purpose.
The University of Prince Edward Island
Last updated: December 29, 2007 | Originally published: