Saint Thomas Aquinas was a Catholic Priest in the Dominican Order and one of the most important Medieval philosophers and theologians. He was immensely influenced by scholasticism and Aristotle and known for his synthesis of the two aforementioned traditions. Although he wrote many works of philosophy and theology throughout his life, his most influential work is the Summa Theologica which consists of three parts.
The first part is on God. In it, he gives five proofs for God’s existence as well as an explication of His attributes. He argues for the actuality and incorporeality of God as the unmoved mover and describes how God moves through His thinking and willing.
The second part is on Ethics. Thomas argues for a variation of the Aristotelian Virtue Ethics. However, unlike Aristotle, he argues for a connection between the virtuous man and God by explaining how the virtuous act is one towards the blessedness of the Beatific Vision (beata visio).
The last part of the Summa is on Christ and was unfinished when Thomas died. In it, he shows how Christ not only offers salvation, but represents and protects humanity on Earth and in Heaven. This part also briefly discusses the sacraments and eschatology. The Summa remains the most influential of Thomas’s works and is mostly what will be discussed in this overview of his philosophy.
The birth-year of Thomas Aquinas is commonly given as 1227, but he was probably born early in 1225 at his father’s castle of Roccasecea (75 m. e.s.e. of Rome) in Neapolitan territory. He died at the monastery of Fossanova, one mile from Sonnino (64 m. s.e. of Rome), Mar. 7, 1274. His father was Count Landulf of an old high-born south Italian family, and his mother was Countess Theodora of Theate, of noble Norman descent. In his fifth year he was sent for his early education to the monastery of Monte Cassino, where his father’s brother Sinibald was abbot. Later he studied in Naples. By about 1243 he determined to enter the Dominican order; but on the way to Rome he was seized by his brothers and brought back to his parents at the castle of S. Giovanni, where he was held a captive for a year or two and besieged with prayers, threats, and even sensual temptation to make him relinquish his purpose. Finally the family yielded and the order sent Thomas to Cologne to study under Albertus Magnus, where he arrived probably toward the end of 1244. He accompanied Albertus to Paris in 1245, remained there with his teacher, continuing his studies for three years, and followed Albertus at the latter’s return to Cologne in 1248. For several years longer he remained with the famous philosopher of scholasticism, presumably teaching. This long association of Thomas with the great polyhistor was the most important influence in his development; it made him a comprehensive scholar and won him permanently for the Aristotelian method. Around 1252 Thomas went to Paris for the master’s degree, which he found some difficulty in attaining owing to attacks, at that time on the mendicant orders. Ultimately, however, he received the degree and entered ceremoniously upon his office of teaching in 1257; he taught in Paris for several years and there wrote certain of his works and began others. In 1259 he was present at an important chapter of his order at Valenciennes at the solicitation of Pope Urban IV. Therefore not before the latter part of 1261, he took up residence in Rome. In 1269-71 he was again active in Paris. In 1272 the provincial chapter at Florence empowered him to found a new studium generale at any place he should choose, and he selected Naples. Early in 1274 the pope directed him to attend the Council of Lyons and he undertook the journey, although he was far from well. On the way he stopped at the castle of a niece and became seriously ill. He wished to end his days in a monastery and not being able to reach a house of the Dominicans he was carried to the Cistercian Fossanova. There he died and his remains were preserved.
The writings of Thomas may be classified as: (1) exegetical, homiletical, and liturgical; (2) dogmatic, apologetic, and ethical; and (3) philosophical. Among the genuine works of the first class were: Commentaries on Job (1261-65); on Psalms, according to some a reportatum, or report of speeches furnished by his companion Raynaldus; on Isaiah; the Catena aurea, which is a running commentary on the four Gospels, constructed on numerous citations from the Fathers; probably a Commentary on Canticles, and on Jeremiah; and wholly or partly reportata, on John, on Matthew, and on the epistles of Paul; including, according to one authority, Hebrews i.-x. Thomas prepared for Urban IV: Officium de corpore Christi (1264); and the following works may be either genuine or reportata: Expositio angelicce salutationis; Tractatus de decem praeceptis; Orationis dominico expositio; Sermones pro dominicis diebus et pro sanctorum solemnitatibus; Sermones de angelis, and Sermones de quadragesima. Of his sermons only manipulated copies are extant. In the second division were: In quatitor sententiarum libros, of his first Paris sojourn; Questiones disputatce, written at Paris and Rome; Questiones quodlibetales duodecini; Summa catholicce fidei contra gentiles (1261-C,4); andthe Summa theologica. To the dogmatic works belong also certain commentaries, as follows: Expositio in librum beati Dionysii de divinis nominibits; Expositiones primoe et secundce; In Boethii libros de hebdomadibus; and Proeclare quoestiones super librum Boethii de trinitate. A large number ofopuscitla also belonged to this group. Of philosophical writings there are cataloged thirteen commentaries on Aristotle, besides numerous philosophical opuscula of which fourteen are classed as genuine.
The greatest work of Thomas was the Summa, and it is the fullest presentation of his views. He worked on it from the time of Clement IV (after 1265) until the end of his life. When he died he had reached question ninety of part III, on the subject of penance. What was lacking was afterward added from the fourth book of his commentary on the “Sentences” of Peter Lombard as a supplementum, which is not found in manuscripts of the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. The Summa consists of three parts. Part I treats of God, who is the “first cause, himself uncaused” (primum movens immobile) and as such existent only in act (actu), that is pure actuality without potentiality and, therefore, without corporeality. His essence is actus purus et perfectus. This follows from the fivefold proof for the existence of God; namely, there must be a first mover himself unmoved, a first cause in the chain of causes, an absolutely necessary being, an absolutely perfect being, and a rational designer. In this connection the thoughts of the unity, infinity, unchangeableness, and goodness of the highest being are deduced. The spiritual being of God is further defined as thinking and willing. His knowledge is absolutely perfect since he knows himself and all things as appointed by him. Since every knowing being strives after the thing known as end, will is implied in knowing. Inasmuch as God knows himself as the perfect good, he wills himself as end. But in that everything is willed by God, everything is brought by the divine will to himself in the relation of means to end. Therein God wills good to every being which exists, that is he loves it; and, therefore, love is the fundamental relation of God to the world. If the divine love be thought of simply as act of will, it exists for every creature in like measure: but if the good assured by love to the individual be thought of, it exists for different beings in various degrees. In so far as the loving God gives to every being what it needs in relation practical reason, affording the idea of the moral law of nature, so important in medieval ethics.
The first part of the Summa is summed up in the thought that God governs the world as the universal first cause. God sways the intellect in that he gives the power to know aid impresses the species intelligibileson the mind; and he ways the will in that he holds the good before it as aim, and creates the virtus volendi. To will is nothing else than a certain inclination toward the object of the volition which is the universal good. God works all in all, but so that things also themselves exert their proper efficiency. Here the Areopagitic ideas of the graduated effects of created things play their part in Thomas’s thought. The second part of the Summa (consisting of two parts, namely, prima secundae and secundae, secunda) follows this complex of ideas. Its theme is man’s striving after the highest end, which is the blessedness of the visio beata. Here Thomas develops his system of ethics, which has its root in Aristotle. In a chain of acts of will man strives for the highest end. They are free acts in so far as man has in himself the knowledge of their end and therein the principle of action. In that the will wills the end, it wills also the appropriate means, chooses freely and completes the consensus. Whether the act be good or evil depends on the end. The “human reason” pronounces judgment concerning the character of the end, it is, therefore, the law for action. Human acts, however, are meritorious in so far as they promote the purpose of God and his honor. By repeating a good action man acquires a moral habit or a quality which enables him to do the good gladly and easily. This is true, however, only of the intellectual and moral virtues, which Thomas treats after the mariner of Aristotle; the theological virtues are imparted by God to man as a “disposition” from which the acts here proceed, but while they strengthen, they do not form it. The “disposition” of evil is the opposite alternative. An act becomes evil through deviation from the reason and the divine moral law. Therefore, sin involves two factors: its substance or matter is lust; in form, however, it is deviation from the divine law. Sin has its origin in the will, which decides, against the reason, for a changeable good. Since, however, the will also moves the other powers of man, sin has its seat in these too. By choosing such a lower good as end, the will is misled by self-love, so that this works as cause in every sin. God is not the cause of sin, since, on the contrary, he draws all things to himself. But from another side God is the cause of all things, so he is efficacious also in sin as *-ctio but not as ens. The devil is not directly the cause of sin, but he incites by working on the imagination and the sensuous impulse of man, as men or things may also do. Sin is original. Adam’s first sin passes upon himself and all the succeeding race; because he is the head of the human race and “by virtue of procreation human nature is transmitted and along with nature its infection.” The powers of generation are, therefore, designated especially as “infected.”
In every work of God both justice and mercy are united, and his justice always presupposes his mercy since he owes no one anything and gives more bountifully than is due. As God rules in the world, the “plan of the order of things” preexists in him; i.e., his providence and the exercise of it in his government are what condition as cause everything which comes to pass in the world. Hence follows predestination: from eternity, some are destined to eternal life; while others “he permits some to fall short of that end.” Reprobation, however, is more than mere foreknowledge; it is the “will of permitting anyone to fall into sin and incur the penalty of condemnation for sin.” The effect of predestination is grace. Since God is the first cause of everything, he is the cause of even the free acts of men through predestination. Determinism is deeply grounded in the system of Thomas; things with their source of becoming in God are ordered from eternity as means for the realization of his end in himself. On moral grounds Thomas advocates freedom energetically; but, with his premises, he can have in mind only the psychological form of self-motivation. Nothing in the world is accidental or free, although it may appear so in reference to the proximate cause. From this point of view miracles become necessary in themselves and are to be considered merely as inexplicable to man. From the point of view of the first cause all is unchangeable; although from the limited point of view of the secondary cause miracles may be spoken of. In his doctrine of the Trinity, Thomas starts from the Augustinian system. Since God has only the functions of thinking and willing, only twoprocessiones can be asserted from the Father. However, these establish definite relations of the persons of the Trinity to each other. The relations must be conceived as real and not as merely ideal; for, as with creatures relations arise through certain accidents, since in God there is no accident but all is substance, it follows that “the relation really existing in God is the same as the essence according to the thing.” From another side, however, the relations as real must be really distinguished one from another. Therefore, three persons are to be affirmed in God. Man stands opposite to God; he consists of soul and body. The “intellectual soul” consists of intellect and will. Furthermore the soul is the absolutely indivisible form of man; it is immaterial substance, but not one and the same in all men (as the Averrhoists assumed). The soul’s power of knowing has two sides; a passive (the intellectus possibilis) and an active (theintellectus agens). It is the capacity to form concepts and to abstract the mind’s images (species) from the objects perceived by sense. However, since the abstractions of the intellect from individual things is a universal, the mind knows the universal primarily and directly, and knows the singular only indirectly by virtue of a certain reflection. As certain principles are immanent in the mind for its speculative activity, so also a “special disposition of works,” or the synderesis (rudiment of conscience), is inborn in the scholastics. Held to creationism, they therefore taught that the souls are created by God. Two things according to Thomas constituted man’s righteousness in paradise-the justitia originalis or the harmony of all man’s powers before they were blighted by desire, and the possession of the gratia gratum faciens(the continuous indwelling power of good). Both are lost through original sin, which in form is the “loss of original righteousness.” The consequence of this loss is the disorder and maiming of man’s nature, which shows itself in “ignorance, malice, moral weakness, and especially in concupiscentia, which is the material principle of original sin.” The course of thought here is as follows: when the first man transgressed the order of his nature appointed by nature and grace, he, and with him the human race, lost this order. This negative state is the essence of original sin. From it follow an impairment and perversion of human nature in which thenceforth lower aims rule contrary to nature and release the lower element in man. Since sin is contrary to the divine order, it is guilt, and subject to punishment. Guilt and punishment correspond to each other; and since the “apostasy from the invariable good which is infinite,” fulfilled by man, is unending, it merits everlasting punishment.
The way which leads to God is Christ: and Christ is the theme of part III. It can not be asserted that the incarnation was absolutely necessary, “since God in his omnipotent power could have repaired human nature in many other ways”: but it was the most suitable way both for the purpose of instruction and of satisfaction. The unio between the logos and the human nature is a “relation” between the divine and the human nature which comes about by both natures being brought together in the one person of the logos. An incarnation can be spoken of only in the sense that the human nature began to be in the eternal hypostasis of the divine nature. So Christ is unum since his human nature lacks the hypostasis. The person of the logos, accordingly, has assumed the impersonal human nature, and in such way that the assumption of the soul became the means for the assumption of the body. This union with the human soul is the gratia unionis which leads to the impartation of the gratia habitualis from the logos to the human nature. Thereby all human potentialities are made perfect in Jesus. Besides the perfections given by the vision of God, which Jesus enjoyed from the beginning, he receives all others by the gratia habitualis. In so far, however, as it is the limited human nature which receives these perfections, they are finite. This holds both of the knowledge and the will of Christ. The logos impresses the species intelligibiles of all created things on the soul, but the intellectus agens transforms them gradually into the impressions of sense. On another side, the soul of Christ works miracles only as instrument of the logos, since omnipotence in no way appertains to this human soul in itself. Furthermore, Christ’s human nature partook of imperfections, on the one side to make his true humanity evident, on another side because he would bear the general consequences of sin for humanity. Christ experienced suffering, but blessedness reigned in his soul, which, however, did not extend to his body. Concerning redemption, Thomas teaches that Christ is to be regarded as redeemer after his human nature but in such way that the human nature produces divine effects as organ of divinity. The one side of the work of redemption consists herein, that Christ as head of humanity imparts perfection and virtue to his members. He is the teacher and example of humanity; his whole life and suffering as well as his work after he is exalted serve this end.
This is the first course of thought. Then follows a second complex of thoughts which has the idea of satisfaction as its center. To be sure, God as the highest being could forgive sins without satisfaction; but because his justice and mercy could be best revealed through satisfaction he chose this way. As little, however, as satisfaction is necessary in itself, so little does it offer an equivalent, in a correct sense, for guilt; it is rather a “super-abundant satisfaction,” since on account of the divine subject in Christ in a certain sense his suffering and activity are infinite. With this thought the strict logical deduction of Anselm’s theory is given up. Christ’s suffering bore personal character in that it proceeded out of love and obedience. It was an offering brought to God, which as personal act had the character of merit. Thereby Christ “merited” salvation for men. As Christ still influences men, so does he still work in their behalf continually in heaven through the intercession (interpellatio). In this way Christ as head of humanity effects the forgiveness of their sins, their reconciliation with God, their immunity from punishment, deliverance from the devil, and the opening of heaven’s gate. But inasmuch as all these benefits are already offered through the inner operation of the love of Christ, Thomas has combined the theories of Anselm and Abelard by joining the one to the other.
The doctrine of the sacraments follows the Christology; for the sacraments “have efficacy from the incarnate Word himself.” The sacraments are signs which not only signify sanctification, but also effect it. That they bring spiritual gifts in sensuous form, moreover, is inevitable because of the sensuous nature of man. The res sensibles are the matter, the words of institution are the form of the sacranieits. Contrary to the Franciscan view that the sacraments are mere symbol, whose efficacy God accompanies with a directly following creative act in the soul, Thomas holds it not unfit to say with Hugo of St. Victor that “a sacrament contains grace,” or to teach of the sacraments that they “cause grace.” Thomas attempts to remove the difficulty of a sensuous thing producing a creative effect by a distinction between the causa principalis et instrumentalism. God as the principal cause works through the sensuous thing as the means ordained by him for his end. “Just as instrumental power is acquired by the instrument from this, that it is moved by the principal agent, so also the sacrament obtains spiritual power from the benediction of Christ and the application of the minister to the use of the sacrament. There is spiritual power in the sacraments in so far as they have been ordained by God for a spiritual effect.” This spiritual power remains in the sensuous thing until it has attained its purpose. Thomas distinguished the gratia sacramentalis from the gratia virtutum et donorum in that the former in general perfects the essence and the powers of the soul, and the latter in particular brings to pass necessary spiritual effects for the Christian life. Although, later this distinction was ignored.
In a single statement the effect of the sacraments is to infuse justifying grace into men. Christ’s humanity was the instrument for the operation of his divinity; the sacraments are the instruments through which this operation of Christ’s humanity passes over to men. Christ’s humanity served his divinity as instrumentum conjuncture, like the hand; the sacraments are instruments separate, like a staff; the former can use the latter, as the hand can use a staff.
Of Thomas’ eschatology, according to the commentary on the “Sentences,” only a brief account can here be given. Everlasting blessedness consists for Thomas in the vision of God; and this vision consists not in an abstraction or in a mental image supernaturally produced, but the divine substance itself is beheld. In such a manner, God himself becomes immediately the form of the beholding intellect; that is, God is the object of the vision and at the same time causes the vision. The perfection of the blessed also demands that the body be restored to the soul as something to be made perfect by it. Since blessedness consist in operation, it is made more perfect in that the soul has a definite opcralio with the body. Although, the peculiar act of blessedness (that is, the vision of God) has nothing to do with the body.
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Last updated: May 6, 2009 | Originally published: