Arcesilaus was the sixth head of Plato’s academy. He turned the academy in a skeptical direction. After Plato’s death, the headship of the academy passed to a series of men who developed metaphysical and ethical systems inspired by the positive arguments contained in dialogues such as the Republic and the Phaedo. Arcesilaus, however, turned away from such system-building and instead spent his energies in attacking the arguments of others. According to Cicero, the aim of such attacks was to produce epoche, or suspension of judgment.
Some later commentators claim that by making this skeptical turn, Arcesilaus abandoned Platonism. However, sympathetic writers like the academic skeptic Cicero assert that much of Plato’s writings are actually more in harmony with Arcesilaus’ practice than with dogmatic system-building. In dialogues like the Euthyphro and Laches, Socrates is shown questioning other people’s definitions of terms such as piety and courage. In so doing, Socrates shows that they do not know what they think that they know. However, Socrates’ questioning does not lead to positive answers to the questions he raises. In the Apology Socrates claims that he has no knowledge of his own, but that he is wiser than other people only insofar as he knows that he does not know, whereas others are ignorant even of their own ignorance. Arcesilaus goes beyond this, saying that he knows nothing, not even that that he knows nothing. Later academic skeptics like Cicero also stress the tentative and exploratory nature of dialogues like the Republic: although they do contain positive arguments, the dialogue form, the back-and-forth among the speakers, and Socrates’ own disavowals at many points of having conclusively established what he argues for should make us wary of looking at the dialogues as treatises that expound Platonic doctrine.
The Stoics were the main target of Arcesilaus’ attacks. The founder of Stoicism, Zeno of Citium, developed a systematic and elaborate metaphysics, ethics, and epistemology. Zeno claimed that there are certain sense-impressions—so-called kataleptic or “graspable” impressions—which are the foundation and criterion of knowledge. These impressions come from objects in the environment and accurately represent these objects. The Stoics also thought that the wise person would never assent to what is uncertain, and thus would never be mistaken. Arcesilaus argued that, according to the Stoics’ own standards, the Stoic wise person would never assent to anything, since no sense-impression is ever infallible. For any sense-impression, Arcesilaus said, even if it is accurate, it is always possible in principle that there be a qualitatively indistinguishable sense-impression that is inaccurate, and the wise person would thus have no way of telling which sense-impressions are accurate andwhich ones are not.
The Stoics thought that without a criterion for knowledge, it would be impossible to have any basis on which to act. Arcesilaus, however, said that we can act on the basis the eulogon—the “reasonable.” The eulogon is not a criterion of knowledge, since what is eulogon can be mistaken, but it can be a basis of action.
Arcesilaus left no writings of his own, so we must rely on second and third-hand reports in order to reconstruct his views. Even in ancient times, however, Arcesilaus’ views were heavily debated. One major question is whether Arcesilaus himself thought that it is impossible to gain knowledge, or just that it is impossible, given the assumptions of the Stoics about the nature of knowledge. Similarly, it is not clear whether Arcesilaus advanced the eulogon as his own skeptical criterion for action, or whether he simply advanced it to rebut Stoic claims about the necessity of a criterion of knowledge for action.
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Last updated: January 6, 2002 | Originally published: