Hannah Arendt is a twentieth century political philosopher whose writings do not easily come together into a systematic philosophy that expounds and expands upon a single argument over a sequence of works. Instead, her thoughts span totalitarianism, revolution, the nature of freedom and the faculties of thought and judgment.
The question with which Arendt engages most frequently is the nature of politics and the political life, as distinct from other domains of human activity. Arendt’s work, if it can be said to do any one thing, essentially undertakes a reconstruction of the nature of political existence. This pursuit takes shape as one that is decidedly phenomenological, a pointer to the profound influence exerted on her by Heidegger and Jaspers. Beginning with a phenomenological prioritization of the experiential character of human life and discarding traditional political philosophy’s conceptual schema, Arendt in effect aims to make available the objective structures and characteristics of political being-in-the-world as a distinct mode of human experience. This investigation spans the rest of Arendt’s life and works. During its course, recurrent themes emerge that help to organize her thought–themes such as the possibility and conditions of a humane and democratic public life, the forces that threaten such a life, conflict between private and public interests, and intensified cycles of production and consumption. As these issues reappear, Arendt elaborates on them and refines them, rarely relaxing the enquiry into the nature of political existence. The most famous facet of this enquiry, often considered also to be the most original, is Arendt’s outline of the faculty of human judgment. Through this, she develops a basis upon which publicly-minded political judgment can survive, in spite of the calamitous events of the 20th century which she sees as having destroyed the traditional framework for such judgment.
The article proceeds by charting a roughly chronological map of her major works. It endeavours to illuminate the continuities and connections within these works in an attempt to synchronize them as a coherent but fully-functioning body of thought.
The political philosopher, Hannah Arendt (1906-1975), was born in Hanover, Germany, in 1906, the only child of secular Jews. During childhood, Arendt moved first to Königsberg (East Prussia) and later to Berlin. In 1922-23, Arendt began her studies (in classics and Christian theology) at the University of Berlin, and in 1924 entered Marburg University, where she studied philosophy with Martin Heidegger. In 1925 she began a romantic relationship with Heidegger, but broke this off the following year. She moved to Heidelberg to study with Karl Jaspers, the existentialist philosopher and friend of Heidegger. Under Jasper’s supervision, she wrote her dissertation on the concept of love in St. Augustine’s thought. She remained close to Jaspers throughout her life, although the influence of Heidegger’s phenomenology was to prove the greater in its lasting influence upon Arendt’s work.
In 1929, she met Gunther Stern, a young Jewish philosopher, with whom she became romantically involved, and subsequently married (1930). In 1929, her dissertation (Der Liebesbegriff bei Augustin) was published. In the subsequent years, she continued her involvement in Jewish and Zionist politics, which began from 1926 onwards. In 1933, fearing Nazi persecution, she fled to Paris, where she subsequently met and became friends with both Walter Benjamin and Raymond Aron. In 1936, she met Heinrich Blücher, a German political refugee, divorced Stern in ’39, and the following year she and Blücher married in 1940.
After the outbreak of war, and following detention in a camp as an “enemy alien,” Arendt and Blücher fled to the USA in 1941. Living in New York, Arendt wrote for the German language newspaper Aufbau and directed research for the Commission on European Jewish Cultural Reconstruction. In 1944, she began work on what would become her first major political book, The Origins of Totalitarianism. In 1946, she published “What is Existenz Philosophy,” and from 1946 to 1951 she worked as an editor at Schoken Books in New York. In 1951, The Origins of Totalitarianism was published, after which she began the first in a sequence of visiting fellowships and professorial positions at American universities and she attained American citizenship.
In 1958, she published The Human Condition and Rahel Varnhagen: The Life of a Jewess. In 1959, she published “Reflections on Little Rock,” her controversial consideration of the emergent Black civil rights movement. In 1961, she published Between Past and Future, and traveled to Jerusalem to cover the trial of Nazi Adolf Eichmann for the New Yorker.
In 1963 she published her controversial reflections on the Eichmann trial, first in the New Yorker, and then in book form as Eichmann in Jerusalem: A Report on the Banality of Evil. In this year, she also published On Revolution. In 1967, having held positions at Berkeley and Chicago, she took up a position at the New School for Social Research in New York. In 1968, she published Men in Dark Times.
In 1970, Blücher died. That same year, Arendt gave her seminar on Kant’s philosophy of judgement at the New School (published posthumously as Reflections on Kant’s Political Philosophy, 1982). In 1971 she published “Thinking and Moral Considerations,” and the following year Crisis of the Republicappeared. In the next years, she worked on her projected three-volume work, The Life of the Mind. Volumes 1 and 2 (on “Thinking” and “Willing”) were published posthumously. She died on December 4, 1975, having only just started work on the third and final volume, Judging.
Hannah Arendt is a most challenging figure for anyone wishing to understand the body of her work in political philosophy. She never wrote anything that would represent a systematic political philosophy, a philosophy in which a single central argument is expounded and expanded upon in a sequence of works. Rather, her writings cover many and diverse topics, spanning issues such as totalitarianism, revolution, the nature of freedom, the faculties of “thinking” and “judging,” the history of political thought, and so on. A thinker of heterodox and complicated argumentation, Arendt’s writings draw inspiration from Heidegger, Aristotle, Augustine, Kant, Nietzsche, Jaspers, and others. This complicated synthesis of theoretical elements is evinced in the apparent availability of her thought to a wide and divergent array of positions in political theory: for example, participatory democrats such as Benjamin Barber and Sheldon Wolin, communitarians such as Sandel and MacIntyre, intersubjectivist neo-Kantians such as Habermas, Albrecht Wellmer, Richard Bernstein and Seyla Benhabib, etc. However, it may still be possible to present her thought not as a collection of discrete interventions, but as a coherent body of work that takes a single question and a single methodological approach, which then informs a wide array of inquiries. The question, with which Arendt’s thought engages, perhaps above all others, is that of the nature of politics and political life, as distinct from other domains of human activity. Her attempts to explicate an answer to this question and, inter alia, to examine the historical and social forces that have come to threaten the existence of an autonomous political realm, have a distinctly phenomenological character. Arendt’s work, if it can be said to do anything, can be said to undertake a phenomenological reconstruction of the nature of political existence, with all that this entails in way of thinking and acting.
The phenomenological nature of Arendt’s examination (and indeed defense) of political life can be traced through the profound influence exerted over her by both Heidegger and Jaspers. Heidegger in particular can be seen to have profoundly impacted upon Arendt’s thought in for example: in their shared suspicion of the “metaphysical tradition’s” move toward abstract contemplation and away from immediate and worldly understanding and engagement, in their critique of modern calculative and instrumental attempts to order and dominate the world, in their emphasis upon the ineliminable plurality and difference that characterize beings as worldly appearances, and so on. This is not, however, to gloss over the profound differences that Arendt had with Heidegger, with not only his political affiliation with the Nazis, or his moves later to philosophical-poetic contemplation and his corresponding abdication from political engagement. Nevertheless, it can justifiably be claimed that Arendt’s inquiries follow a crucial impetus from Heidegger’s project in Being & Time.
Arendt’s distinctive approach as a political thinker can be understood from the impetus drawn from Heidegger’s “phenomenology of Being.” She proceeds neither by an analysis of general political concepts (such as authority, power, state, sovereignty, etc.) traditionally associated with political philosophy, nor by an aggregative accumulation of empirical data associated with “political science.” Rather, beginning from a phenomenological prioritization of the “factical” and experiential character of human life, she adopts a phenomenological method, thereby endeavoring to uncover the fundamental structures of political experience. Eschewing the “free-floating constructions” and conceptual schema imposed a posterioriupon experience by political philosophy, Arendt instead follows phenomenology’s return “to the things themselves” (zu den Sachen selbst), aiming by such investigation to make available the objective structures and characteristics of political being-in-the-world, as distinct from other (moral, practical, artistic, productive, etc.) forms of life.
Hence Arendt’s explication of the constitutive features of the vita activa in The Human Condition(labor, work, action) can be viewed as the phenomenological uncovering of the structures of human action qua existence and experience rather then abstract conceptual constructions or empirical generalizations about what people typically do. That is, they approximate with respect to the specificity of the political field the ‘existentials’, the articulations of Dasein‘s Being set out be Heidegger in Being and Time.
This phenomenological approach to the political partakes of a more general revaluation or reversal of the priority traditionally ascribed to philosophical conceptualizations over and above lived experience. That is, the world of common experience and interpretation (Lebenswelt) is taken to be primary and theoretical knowledge is dependent on that common experience in the form of a thematization or extrapolation from what is primordially and pre-reflectively present in everyday experience. It follows, for Arendt, that political philosophy has a fundamentally ambiguous role in its relation to political experience, insofar as its conceptual formulations do not simply articulate the structures of pre-reflective experience but can equally obscure them, becoming self-subsistent preconceptions which stand between philosophical inquiry and the experiences in question, distorting the phenomenal core of experience by imposing upon it the lens of its own prejudices. Therefore, Arendt sees the conceptual core of traditional political philosophy as an impediment, because as it inserts presuppositions between the inquirer and the political phenomena in question. Rather than following Husserl’s methodological prescription of a “bracketing” (epoché) of the prevalent philosophical posture, Arendt’s follows Heidegger’s historical Abbau or Destruktion to clear away the distorting encrustations of the philosophical tradition, thereby aiming to uncover the originary character of political experience which has for the most part been occluded.
There is no simple way of presenting Arendt’s diverse inquiries into the nature and fate of the political, conceived as a distinctive mode of human experience and existence. Her corpus of writings present a range of arguments, and develop a range of conceptual distinctions, that overlap from text to text, forming a web of inter-related excurses. Therefore, perhaps the only way to proceed is to present a summation of her major works, in roughly chronological order, while nevertheless attempting to highlight the continuities that draw them together into a coherent whole.
Arendt’s first major work, published in 1951, is clearly a response to the devastating events of her own time – the rise of Nazi Germany and the catastrophic fate of European Jewry at its hands, the rise of Soviet Stalinism and its annihilation of millions of peasants (not to mention free-thinking intellectual, writers, artists, scientists and political activists). Arendt insisted that these manifestations of political evil could not be understood as mere extensions in scale or scope of already existing precedents, but rather that they represented a completely ‘novel form of government’, one built upon terror and ideological fiction. Where older tyrannies had used terror as an instrument for attaining or sustaining power, modern totalitarian regimes exhibited little strategic rationality in their use of terror. Rather, terror was no longer a means to a political end, but an end in itself. Its necessity was now justified by recourse to supposed laws of history (such as the inevitable triumph of the classless society) or nature (such as the inevitability of a war between “chosen” and other “degenerate” races).
For Arendt, the popular appeal of totalitarian ideologies with their capacity to mobilize populations to do their bidding, rested upon the devastation of ordered and stable contexts in which people once lived. The impact of the First World War, and the Great Depression, and the spread of revolutionary unrest, left people open to the promulgation of a single, clear and unambiguous idea that would allocate responsibility for woes, and indicate a clear path that would secure the future against insecurity and danger. Totalitarian ideologies offered just such answers, purporting discovered a “key to history” with which events of the past and present could be explained, and the future secured by doing history’s or nature’s bidding. Accordingly the amenability of European populations to totalitarian ideas was the consequence of a series of pathologies that had eroded the public or political realm as a space of liberty and freedom. These pathologies included the expansionism of imperialist capital with its administrative management of colonial suppression, and the usurpation of the state by the bourgeoisie as an instrument by which to further its own sectional interests. This in turn led to the delegitimation of political institutions, and the atrophy of the principles of citizenship and deliberative consensus that had been the heart of the democratic political enterprise. The rise of totalitarianism was thus to be understood in light of the accumulation of pathologies that had undermined the conditions of possibility for a viable public life that could unite citizens, while simultaneously preserving their liberty and uniqueness (a condition that Arendt referred to as “plurality”).
In this early work, it is possible to discern a number of the recurrent themes that would organize Arendt’s political writings throughout her life. For example, the inquiry into the conditions of possibility for a humane and democratic public life, the historical, social and economic forces that had come to threaten it, the conflictual relationship between private interests and the public good, the impact of intensified cycles of production and consumption that destabilized the common world context of human life, and so on. These themes would not only surface again and again in Arendt’s subsequent work, but would be conceptually elaborated through the development of key distinctions in order to delineate the nature of political existence and the faculties exercised in its production and preservation.
The work of establishing the conditions of possibility for political experience, as opposed to other spheres of human activity, was undertaken by Arendt in her next major work, The Human Condition (1958). In this work she undertakes a thorough historical-philosophical inquiry that returned to the origins of both democracy and political philosophy in the Ancient Greek world, and brought these originary understandings of political life to bear on what Arendt saw as its atrophy and eclipse in the modern era. Her goal was to propose a phenomenological reconstruction of different aspects of human activity, so as to better discern the type of action and engagement that corresponded to present political existence. In doing so, she offers a stringent critique of traditional of political philosophy, and the dangers it presents to the political sphere as an autonomous domain of human practice.
The Human Condition is fundamentally concerned with the problem of reasserting the politics as a valuable ream of human action, praxis, and the world of appearances. Arendt argues that the Western philosophical tradition has devalued the world of human action which attends to appearances (the vita activa), subordinating it to the life of contemplation which concerns itself with essences and the eternal (the vita contemplativa). The prime culprit is Plato, whose metaphysics subordinates action and appearances to the eternal realm of the Ideas. The allegory of The Cave in The Republic begins the tradition of political philosophy; here Plato describes the world of human affairs in terms of shadows and darkness, and instructs those who aspire to truth to turn away from it in favor of the “clear sky of eternal ideas.” This metaphysical hierarchy, theôria is placed above praxis and epistêmê over mere doxa. The realm of action and appearance (including the political) is subordinated to and becomes instrumental for the ends of the Ideas as revealed to the philosopher who lives the bios theôretikos. In The Human Condition and subsequent works, the task Arendt set herself is to save action and appearance, and with it the common life of the political and the values of opinion, from the depredations of the philosophers. By systematically elaborating what this vita activa might be said to entail, she hopes to reinstate the life of public and political action to apex of human goods and goals.
In The Human Condition Arendt argues for a tripartite division between the human activities of labor, work, and action. Moreover, she arranges these activities in an ascending hierarchy of importance, and identifies the overturning of this hierarchy as central to the eclipse of political freedom and responsibility which, for her, has come to characterize the modern age.
Labor is that activity which corresponds to the biological processes and necessities of human existence, the practices which are necessary for the maintenance of life itself. Labor is distinguished by its never-ending character; it creates nothing of permanence, its efforts are quickly consumed, and must therefore be perpetually renewed so as to sustain life. In this aspect of its existence humanity is closest to the animals and so, in a significant sense, the least human (“What men [sic] share with all other forms of animal life was not considered to be human”). Indeed, Arendt refers to humanity in this mode as animal laborans. Because the activity of labor is commanded by necessity, the human being as laborer is the equivalent of the slave; labor is characterized by unfreedom. Arendt argues that it is precisely the recognition of labor as contrary to freedom, and thus to what is distinctively human, which underlay the institution of slavery amongst the ancient Greeks; it was the attempt to exclude labor from the conditions of human life. In view of this characterization of labor, it is unsurprising that Arendt is highly critical of Marx’s elevation of animal laborans to a position of primacy in his vision of the highest ends of human existence. Drawing on the Aristotelian distinction of the oikos (the private realm of the household) from the polis (the public realm of the political community), Arendt argues that matters of labor, economy and the like properly belong to the former, not the latter. The emergence of necessary labor , the private concerns of the oikos, into the public sphere (what Arendt calls “the rise of the social”) has for her the effect of destroying the properly political by subordinating the public realm of human freedom to the concerns mere animal necessity. The prioritization of the economic which has attended the rise of capitalism has for Arendt all but eclipsed the possibilities of meaningful political agency and the pursuit of higher ends which should be the proper concern of public life.
If labor relates to the natural and biologically necessitated dimension of human existence, then work is “the activity which corresponds to the unnaturalness of human existence, which is not embedded in, and whose mortality is not compensated by, the species’ ever-recurring life-cycle.” Work (as both technê andpoiesis) corresponds to the fabrication of an artificial world of things, artifactual constructions which endure temporally beyond the act of creation itself. Work thus creates a world distinct from anything given in nature, a world distinguished by its durability, its semi-permanence and relative independence from the individual actors and acts which call it into being. Humanity in this mode of its activity Arendt names homo faber; he/she is the builder of walls (both physical and cultural) which divide the human realm from that of nature and provide a stable context (a “common world”) of spaces and institutions within which human life can unfold. Homo faber‘s typical representatives are the builder, the architect, the craftsperson, the artist and the legislator, as they create the public world both physically and institutionally by constructing buildings and making laws.
It should be clear that work stands in clear distinction from labor in a number of ways. Firstly, whereas labor is bound to the demands of animality, biology and nature, work violates the realm of nature by shaping and transforming it according to the plans and needs of humans; this makes work a distinctly human (i.e. non-animal) activity. Secondly, because work is governed by human ends and intentions it is under humans’ sovereignty and control, it exhibits a certain quality of freedom, unlike labor which is subject to nature and necessity. Thirdly, whereas labor is concerned with satisfying the individual’s life-needs and so remains essentially a private affair, work is inherently public; it creates an objective and common world which both stands between humans and unites them. While work is not the mode of human activity which corresponds to politics, its fabrications are nonetheless the preconditions for the existence of a political community. The common world of institutions and spaces that work creates furnish the arena in which citizens may come together as members of that shared world to engage in political activity. In Arendt’s critique of modernity the world created by homo faber is threatened with extinction by the aforementioned “rise of the social.” The activity of labor and the consumption of its fruits, which have come to dominate the public sphere, cannot furnish a common world within which humans might pursue their higher ends. Labor and its effects are inherently impermanent and perishable, exhausted as they are consumed, and so do not possess the qualities of quasi-permanence which are necessary for a shared environment and common heritage which endures between people and across time. In industrial modernity “all the values characteristic of the world of fabrication – permanence, stability, durability…are sacrificed in favor of the values of life, productivity and abundance.” The rise of animal laborans threatens the extinction of homo faber, and with it comes the passing of those worldly conditions which make a community’s collective and public life possible (what Arendt refers to as “world alienation”).
So, we have the activity of labor which meets the needs that are essential for the maintenance of humanities physical existence, but by virtue of its necessary quality occupies the lowest rung on the hierarchy of the vita activa. Then we have work, which is a distinctly human (i.e. non-animal) activity which fabricates the enduring, public and common world of our collective existence. However, Arendt is at great pains to establish that the activity of homo faber does not equate with the realm of human freedom and so cannot occupy the privileged apex of the human condition. For work is still subject to a certain kind of necessity, that which arises from its essentially instrumental character. As technê andpoiesis the act is dictated by and subordinated to ends and goals outside itself; work is essentially ameans to achieve the thing which is to be fabricated (be it a work of art, a building or a structure of legal relations) and so stands in a relation of mere purposiveness to that end. (Again it is Plato who stands accused of the instrumentalization of action, of its conflation with fabrication and subordination to an external teleology as prescribed by his metaphysical system). For Arendt, the activity of work cannot be fully free insofar as it is not an end in itself, but is determined by prior causes and articulated ends. The quality of freedom in the world of appearances (which for Arendt is the sine qua non of politics) is to be found elsewhere in the vita activa, namely with the activity of action proper.
The fundamental defining quality of action is its ineliminable freedom, its status as an end in itself and so as subordinate to nothing outside itself. Arendt argues that it is a mistake to take freedom to be primarily an inner, contemplative or private phenomenon, for it is in fact active, worldly and public. Our sense of an inner freedom is derivative upon first having experienced “a condition of being free as a tangible worldly reality. We first become aware of freedom or its opposite in our intercourse with others, not in the intercourse with ourselves.” In defining action as freedom, and freedom as action, we can see the decisive influence of Augustine upon Arendt’s thought. From Augustine’s political philosophy she takes the theme of human action as beginning:
To act, in its most general sense, means to take initiative, to begin (as the Greek word archein, ‘to begin,’ ‘to lead,’ and eventually ‘to rule’ indicates), to set something in motion. Because they are initium, newcomers and beginners by virtue of birth, men take initiative, are prompted into action.
And further, that freedom is to be seen:
as a character of human existence in the world. Man does not so much possess freedom as he, or better his coming into the world, is equated with the appearance of freedom in the universe; man is free because he is a beginning…
In short, humanity represents/articulates/embodies the faculty of beginning. It follows from this equation of freedom, action and beginning that freedom is “an accessory of doing and acting;” “Men are free…as long as they act, neither before nor after; for to be free and to act are the same.” This capacity for initiation gives actions the character of singularity and uniqueness, as “it is in the nature of beginning that something new is started which cannot be expected from whatever happened before.” So, intrinsic to the human capacity for action is the introduction of genuine novelty, the unexpected, unanticipated and unpredictable into the world:
The new always happens against the overwhelming odds of statistical laws and their probability, which for all practical, everyday purposes amounts to certainty; the new therefore always appears in the guise of a miracle.
This “miraculous,” initiatory quality distinguishes genuine action from mere behavior i.e. from conduct which has an habituated, regulated, automated character; behavior falls under the determinations ofprocess, is thoroughly conditioned by causal antecedents, and so is essentially unfree. The definition of human action in terms of freedom and novelty places it outside the realm of necessity or predictability. Herein lies the basis of Arendt’s quarrel with Hegel and Marx, for to define politics or the unfolding of history in terms of any teleology or immanent or objective process is to deny what is central to authentic human action, namely, its capacity to initiate the wholly new, unanticipated, unexpected, unconditioned by the laws of cause and effect.
It has been argued that Arendt is a political existentialist who, in seeking the greatest possible autonomy for action, falls into the danger of aestheticising action and advocating decisionism. Yet political existentialism lays great stress on individual will and on decision as “an act of existential choice unconstrained by principles or norms.” In contradistinction, Arendt’s theory holds that actions cannot be justified for their own sake, but only in light of their public recognition and the shared rules of a political community. For Arendt, action is a public category, a worldly practice that is experienced in our intercourse with others, and so is a practice that “both presupposes and can be actualized only in a human polity.” As Arendt puts it:
Action, the only activity that goes on directly between men…corresponds to the human condition of plurality, to the fact that men, not Man, live on the earth and inhabit the world. While all aspects of the human condition are somehow related to politics, this plurality is specifically the condition – not only theconditio sine qua non, but the conditio per quam – of all political life .
Another way of understanding the importance of publicity and plurality for action is to appreciate that action would be meaningless unless there were others present to see it and so give meaning to it. The meaning of the action and the identity of the actor can only be established in the context of human plurality, the presence others sufficiently like ourselves both to understand us and recognize the uniqueness of ourselves and our acts. This communicative and disclosive quality of action is clear in the way that Arendt connects action most centrally to speech. It is through action as speech that individuals come to disclose their distinctive identity: “Action is the public disclosure of the agent in the speech deed.” Action of this character requires a public space in which it can be realized, a context in which individuals can encounter one another as members of a community. For this space, as for much else, Arendt turns to the ancients, holding up the Athenian polis as the model for such a space of communicative and disclosive speech deeds. Such action is for Arendt synonymous with the political; politics is the ongoing activity of citizens coming together so as to exercise their capacity for agency, to conduct their lives together by means of free speech and persuasion. Politics and the exercise of freedom-as-action are one and the same:
…freedom…is actually the reason that men live together in political organisations at all. Without it, political life as such would be meaningless. The raison d’être of politics is freedom, and its field of experience is action.
From the historical-philosophical treatment of the political in The Human Condition, it might appear that for Arendt an authentic politics (as freedom of action, public deliberation and disclosure) has been decisively lost in the modern era. Yet in her next major work, On Revolution (1961) she takes her rethinking of political concepts and applies them to the modern era, with ambivalent results.
Arendt takes issue with both liberal and Marxist interpretations of modern political revolutions (such as the French and American). Against liberals, the disputes the claim that these revolutions were primarily concerned with the establishment of a limited government that would make space for individual liberty beyond the reach of the state. Against Marxist interpretations of the French Revolution, she disputes the claim that it was driven by the “social question,” a popular attempt to overcome poverty and exclusion by the many against the few who monopolized wealth in the ancien regime. Rather, Arendt claims, what distinguishes these modern revolutions is that they exhibit (albeit fleetingly) the exercise of fundamental political capacities – that of individuals acting together, on the basis of their mutually agreed common purposes, in order to establish a tangible public space of freedom. It is in this instauration, the attempt to establish a public and institutional space of civic freedom and participation, that marks out these revolutionary moments as exemplars of politics qua action.
Yet Arendt sees both the French and American revolutions as ultimately failing to establish a perduring political space in which the on-going activities of shared deliberation, decision and coordinated action could be exercised. In the case of the French Revolution, the subordination of political freedom to matters of managing welfare (the “social question”) reduces political institutions to administering the distribution of goods and resources (matters that belong properly in the oikos, dealing as they do with the production and reproduction of human existence). Meanwhile, the American Revolution evaded this fate, and by means of the Constitution managed to found a political society on the basis of comment assent. Yet she saw it only as a partial and limited success. America failed to create an institutional space in which citizens could participate in government, in which they could exercise in common those capacities of free expression, persuasion and judgement that defined political existence. The average citizen, while protected from arbitrary exercise of authority by constitutional checks and balances, was no longer a participant “in judgement and authority,” and so became denied the possibility of exercising his/her political capacities.
Published in the same year as On Revolution, Arendt’s book about the Eichmann trial presents both a continuity with her previous works, but also a change in emphasis that would continue to the end of her life. This work marks a shift in her concerns from the nature of political action, to a concern with the faculties that underpin it – the interrelated activities of thinking and judging.
She controversially uses the phrase “the banality of evil” to characterize Eichmann’s actions as a member of the Nazi regime, in particular his role as chief architect and executioner of Hitler’s genocidal “final solution” (Endlosung) for the “Jewish problem.” Her characterization of these actions, so obscene in their nature and consequences, as “banal” is not meant to position them as workaday. Rather it is meant to contest the prevalent depictions of the Nazi’s inexplicable atrocities as having emanated from a malevolent will to do evil, a delight in murder. As far as Arendt could discern, Eichmann came to his willing involvement with the program of genocide through a failure or absence of the faculties of sound thinking and judgement. From Eichmann’s trial in Jerusalem (where he had been brought after Israeli agents found him in hiding in Argentina), Arendt concluded that far from exhibiting a malevolent hatred of Jews which could have accounted psychologically for his participation in the Holocaust, Eichmann was an utterly innocuous individual. He operated unthinkingly, following orders, efficiently carrying them out, with no consideration of their effects upon those he targeted. The human dimension of these activities were not entertained, so the extermination of the Jews became indistinguishable from any other bureaucratically assigned and discharged responsibility for Eichmann and his cohorts.
Arendt concluded that Eichmann was constitutively incapable of exercising the kind of judgement that would have made his victims’ suffering real or apparent for him. It was not the presence of hatred that enabled Eichmann to perpetrate the genocide, but the absence of the imaginative capacities that would have made the human and moral dimensions of his activities tangible for him. Eichmann failed to exercise his capacity of thinking, of having an internal dialogue with himself, which would have permitted self-awareness of the evil nature of his deeds. This amounted to a failure to use self-reflection as a basis forjudgement, the faculty that would have required Eichmann to exercise his imagination so as to contemplate the nature of his deeds from the experiential standpoint of his victims. This connection between the complicity with political evil and the failure of thinking and judgement inspired the last phase of Arendt’s work, which sought to explicate the nature of these faculties and their constitutive role for politically and morally responsible choices.
Arendt’s concern with thinking and judgement as political faculties stretches back to her earliest works, and were addressed subsequently in a number of essays written during the 1950s and 1960s. However, in the last phase of her work, she turned to examine these faculties in a concerted and systematic way. Unfortunately, her work was incomplete at the time of her death – only the first two volumes of the projected 3-volume work, Life of the Mind, had been completed. However, the posthumously publishedLectures on Kant’s Political Philosophy delineate what might reasonably be supposed as her “mature” reflections on political judgement.
In the first volume of Life of the Mind, dealing with the faculty of thinking, Arendt is at pains to distinguish it from “knowing.” She draws upon Kant’s distinction between knowing or understanding (Verstand) and thinking or reasoning (Vernunft). Understanding yields positive knowledge – it is the quest for knowable truths. Reason or thinking, on the other hand, drives us beyond knowledge, persistently posing questions that cannot be answered from the standpoint of knowledge, but which we nonetheless cannot refrain from asking. For Arendt, thinking amounts to a quest to understand the meaning of our world, the ceaseless and restless activity of questioning that which we encounter. The value of thinking is not that it yields positive results that can be considered settled, but that it constantly returns to question again and again the meaning that we give to experiences, actions and circumstances. This, for Arendt, is intrinsic to the exercise of political responsibility – the engagement of this faculty that seeks meaning through a relentless questioning (including self-questioning). It was precisely the failure of this capacity that characterized the “banality” of Eichmann’s propensity to participate in political evil.
The cognate faculty of judgement has attracted most attention is her writing on, deeply inter-connected with thinking, yet standing distinct from it. Her theory of judgement is widely considered as one of the most original parts of her oeuvre, and certainly one of the most influential in recent years.
Arendt’s concern with political judgement, and its crisis in the modern era, is a recurrent theme in her work. As noted earlier, Arendt bemoans the “world alienation” that characterizes the modern era, the destruction of a stable institutional and experiential world that could provide a stable context in which humans could organize their collective existence. Moreover, it will be recalled that in human action Arendt recognizes (for good or ill) the capacity to bring the new, unexpected, and unanticipated into the world. This quality of action means that it constantly threatens to defy or exceed our existing categories of understanding or judgement; precedents and rules cannot help us judge properly what is unprecedented and new. So for Arendt, our categories and standards of thought are always beset by their potential inadequacy with respect to that which they are called upon to judge. However, this aporia of judgement reaches a crisis point in the 20th century under the repeated impact of its monstrous and unprecedented events. The mass destruction of two World Wars, the development of technologies which threaten global annihilation, the rise of totalitarianism, and the murder of millions in the Nazi death camps and Stalin’s purges have effectively exploded our existing standards for moral and political judgement. Tradition lies in shattered fragments around us and “the very framework within which understanding and judging could arise is gone.” The shared bases of understanding, handed down to us in our tradition, seem irretrievably lost. Arendt confronts the question: on what basis can one judge the unprecedented, the incredible, the monstrous which defies our established understandings and experiences? If we are to judge at all, it must now be “without preconceived categories and…without the set of customary rules which is morality;” it must be “thinking without a banister.” In order to secure the possibility of such judgement Arendt must establish that there in fact exists “an independent human faculty, unsupported by law and public opinion, that judges anew in full spontaneity every deed and intent whenever the occasion arises.” This for Arendt comes to represent “one of the central moral questions of all time, namely…the nature and function of human judgement.” It is with this goal and this question in mind that the work of Arendt’s final years converges on the “unwritten political philosophy” of Kant’s Critique of Judgement.
Arendt eschews “determinate judgement,” judgement that subsumes particulars under a universal or rule that already exists. Instead, she turns to Kant’s account of “reflective judgement,” the judgement of a particular for which no rule or precedent exists, but for which some judgement must nevertheless be arrived at. What Arendt finds so valuable in Kant’s account is that reflective judgement proceeds from the particular with which it is confronted, yet nevertheless has a universalizing moment – it proceeds from the operation of a capacity that is shared by all beings possessed of the faculties of reason and understanding. Kant requires us to judge from this common standpoint, on the basis of what we share with all others, by setting aside our own egocentric and private concerns or interests. The faculty of reflective judgement requires us to set aside considerations which are purely private (matters of personal liking and private interest) and instead judge from the perspective of what we share in common with others (i.e. must bedisinterested). Arendt places great weight upon this notion of a faculty of judgement that “thinks from the standpoint of everyone else.” This “broadened way of thinking” or “enlarged mentality” enables us to “compare our judgement not so much with the actual as rather with the merely possible judgement of others, and [thus] put ourselves in the position of everybody else…” For Arendt, this “representative thinking” is made possible by the exercise of the imagination – as Arendt beautifully puts it, “To think with an enlarged mentality means that one trains one’s imagination to go visiting.” “Going visiting” in this way enables us to make individual, particular acts of judgement which can nevertheless claim a public validity. In this faculty, Arendt find a basis upon which a disinterested and publicly-minded form of political judgement could subvene, yet be capable of tackling the unprecedented circumstances and choices that the modern era confronts us with.
We can briefly consider the influence that Arendt’s work has exerted over other political thinkers. This is not easy to summarize, as many and varied scholars have sought inspiration from some part or other of Arendt’s work. However, we may note the importance that her studies have had for the theory and analysis of totalitarianism and the nature and origins of political violence. Similarly, her reflections on the distinctiveness of modern democratic revolutions have been important in the development of republican thought, and for the recent revival of interest in civic mobilizations and social movements (particularly in the wake of 1989′s ‘velvet revolutions’ in the former communist states of Eastern and Central Europe).
More specifically, Arendt has decisively influenced critical and emancipatory attempts to theorize political reasoning and deliberation. For example, Jürgen Habermas admits the formative influence of Arendt upon his own theory of communicative reason and discourse ethics. Particularly important is the way in which Arendt comes to understand power, namely as “the capacity to agree in uncoerced communication on some community action.” Her model of action as public, communicative, persuasive and consensual reappears in Habermas’ thought in concepts such as that of “communicative power” which comes about whenever members of a life-world act in concert via the medium of language. It also reappears in his critique of the “scientization of politics” and his concomitant defense of practical, normative reason in the domain of life-world relations from the hegemony of theoretical and technical modes of reasoning. Others (such as Jean-Luc Nancy) have likewise been influenced by her critique of the modern technological “leveling” of human distinctiveness, often reading Arendt’s account in tandem with Heidegger’s critique of technology. Her theory of judgement has been used by Critical Theorists and Postmoderns alike. Amongst the former, Seyla Benhabib draws explicitly and extensively upon it in order to save discourse ethics from its own universalist excesses; Arendt’s attention to the particular, concrete, unique and lived phenomena of human life furnishes Benhabib with a strong corrective for Habermas’ tendency for abstraction, while nonetheless preserving the project of a universalizing vision of ethical-political life. For the Postmoderns, such as Lyotard, the emphasis placed upon reflective judgement furnishes a “post-foundational” or “post-universalist” basis in which the singularity of moral judgements can be reconciled with some kind of collective adherence to political principles.
It is worth noting some of the prominent criticisms that have been leveled against Arendt’s work.
Primary amongst these is her reliance upon a rigid distinction between the “private” and “public,” the oikos and the polis, to delimit the specificity of the political realm. Feminists have pointed out that the confinement of the political to the realm outside the household has been part and parcel of the domination of politics by men, and the corresponding exclusion of women’s experiences of subjection from legitimate politics. Marxists have likewise pointed to the consequences of confining matters of material distribution and economic management to the extra-political realm of the oikos, thereby delegitimating questions of material social justice, poverty, and exploitation from political discussion and contestation. The shortcoming of this distinction in Arendt’s work is amply illustrated by a well-known and often-cited incident. While attending a conference in 1972, she was put under question by the Frankfurt School Critical Theorist Albrecht Wellmer, regarding her distinction of the “political” and the “social,” and its consequences. Arendt pronounced that housing and homelessness (themes of the conference) were not political issues, but that they were external to the political as the sphere of the actualization of freedom; the political is about human self-disclosure in speech and deed, not about the distribution of goods, which belongs to the social realm as an extension of the oikos. It may be said that Arendt’s attachment to a fundamental and originary understanding of political life precisely misses the fact that politics is intrinsically concerned with the contestation of what counts as a legitimate public concern, with the practice of politics attempting to introduce new, heretofore ‘non-political’ issues, into realm of legitimate political concern.
Arendt has also come under criticism for her overly enthusiastic endorsement of the Athenian polis as an exemplar of political freedom, to the detriment of modern political regimes and institutions. Likewise, the emphasis she places upon direct citizen deliberation as synonymous with the exercise of political freedom excludes representative models, and might be seen as unworkable in the context of modern mass societies, with the delegation, specialization, expertise and extensive divisions of labor needed to deal with their complexity. Her elevation of politics to the apex of human good and goals has also been challenged, demoting as it does other modes of human action and self-realization to a subordinate status. There are also numerous criticisms that have been leveled at her unorthodox readings of other thinkers, and her attempts to synthesize conflicting philosophical viewpoints in attempt to develop her own position (for example, her attempt to mediate Aristotle’s account of experientially-grounded practical judgement (phronesis) with Kant’s transcendental-formal model).
All these, and other criticisms notwithstanding, Arendt remains one of the most original, challenging and influential political thinkers of the 20th century, and her work will no doubt continue to provide inspiration for political philosophy as we enter the 21st.
Last updated: July 22, 2005 | Originally published: