Argument

The word “argument” can be used to designate a dispute or a fight, or it can be used more technically. The focus of this article is on understanding an argument as a collection of truth-bearers (that is, the things that bear truth and falsity, or are true and false) some of which are offered as reasons for one of them, the conclusion. This article takes propositions rather than sentences or statements or utterances to be the primary truth bearers. The reasons offered within the argument are called “premises”, and the proposition that the premises are offered for is called the “conclusion”. This sense of “argument” diverges not only from the above sense of a dispute or fight but also from the formal logician’s sense according to which an argument is merely a list of statements, one of which is designated as the conclusion and the rest of which are designated as premises regardless of whether the premises are offered as reasons for believing the conclusion. Arguments, as understood in this article, are the subject of study in critical thinking and informal logic courses in which students usually learn, among other things, how to identify, reconstruct, and evaluate arguments given outside the classroom.

Arguments, in this sense, are typically distinguished from both implications and inferences. In asserting that a proposition P implies proposition Q, one does not thereby offer P as a reason for Q. The proposition frogs are mammals implies that frogs are not reptiles, but it is problematic to offer the former as a reason for believing the latter. If an arguer offers an argument in order to persuade an audience that the conclusion is true, then it is plausible to think that the arguer is inviting the audience to make an inference from the argument’s premises to its conclusion. However, an inference is a form of reasoning, and as such it is distinct from an argument in the sense of a collection of propositions (some of which are offered as reasons for the conclusion). One might plausibly think that a person S infers Q from P just in case S comes to believe Q because S believes that P is true and because S believes that the truth of P justifies belief that Q. But this movement of mind from P to Q is something different from the argument composed of just P and Q.

The characterization of argument in the first paragraph requires development since there are forms of reasoning such as explanations which are not typically regarded as arguments even though (explanatory) reasons are offered for a proposition. Two principal approaches to fine-tuning this first-step characterization of arguments are what may be called the structural and pragmatic approaches. The pragmatic approach is motivated by the view that the nature of an argument cannot be completely captured in terms of its structure. In what follows, each approach is described, and criticism is briefly entertained.  Along the way, distinctive features of arguments are highlighted that seemingly must be accounted for by any plausible characterization. The classification of arguments as deductive, inductive, and conductive is discussed in section 3.

1. The Structural Approach to Characterizing Arguments

Not any group of propositions qualifies as an argument. The starting point for structural approaches is the thesis that the premises of an argument are reasons offered in support of its conclusion (for example, Govier 2010, p.1, Bassham, G., W. Irwin, H. Nardone, J. Wallace 2005, p.30, Copi and Cohen 2005, p.7; for discussion, see Johnson 2000, p.146ff ). Accordingly, a collection of propositions lacks the structure of an argument unless there is a reasoner who puts forward some as reasons in support of one of them. Letting P1, P2, P3, …, and C range over propositions and R over reasoners, a structural characterization of argument takes the following form.

A collection of propositions, P1, …, Pn, C, is an argument if and only if there is a reasoner R who puts forward the Pi as reasons in support of C.

The structure of an argument is not a function of the syntactic and semantic features of the propositions that compose it. Rather, it is imposed on these propositions by the intentions of a reasoner to use some as support for one of them. Typically in presenting an argument, a reasoner will use expressions to flag the intended structural components of her argument. Typical premise indicators include: “because”, “since”, “for”, and “as”; typical conclusion indicators include “therefore”, “thus”, “hence”, and “so”. Note well: these expressions do not always function in these ways, and so their mere use does not necessitate the presence of an argument.

Different accounts of the nature of the intended support offered by the premises for the conclusion in an argument generate different structural characterizations of arguments (for discussion see Hitchcock 2007). Plausibly, if a reasoner R puts forward premises in support of a conclusion C, then (i)-(iii) obtain. (i) The premises represent R’s reasons for believing that the conclusion is true and R thinks that her belief in the truth of the premises is justified. (ii) R believes that the premises make C more probable than not. (iii) (a) R believes that the premises are independent of C ( that is, R thinks that her reasons for the premises do not include belief that C is true), and (b) R believes that the premises are relevant to establishing that C is true. If we judge that a reasoner R presents an argument as defined above, then by the lights of (i)-(iii) we believe that R believes that the premises justify belief in the truth of the conclusion.  In what immediately follows, examples are given to explicate (i)-(iii).

A: John is an only child.

B: John is not an only child; he said that Mary is his sister.

If B presents an argument, then the following obtain. (i) B believes that the premise ( that is, Mary is John’s sister) is true, B thinks this belief is justified, and the premise is B’s reason for maintaining the conclusion. (ii) B believes that John said that Mary is his sister makes it more likely than not that John is not an only child, and (iii) B thinks that that John said that Mary is his sister is both independent of the proposition that Mary is John’s sister and relevant to confirming it.

A: The Democrats and Republicans don’t seem willing to compromise.

B: If the Democrats and Republicans are not willing to compromise, then the U.S. will go over the fiscal cliff.

B’s assertion of a conditional does not require that B believe either the antecedent or consequent. Therefore, it is unlikely that B puts forward the Democrats and Republicans are not willing to compromise as a reason in support of the U.S. will go over the fiscal cliff, because it is unlikely that B believes either proposition. Hence, it is unlikely that B’s response to A has the structure of an argument, because (i) is not satisfied.

A: Doctor B, what is the reason for my uncle’s muscular weakness?

B: The results of the test are in. Even though few syphilis patients get paresis, we suspect that the reason for your uncle’s paresis is the syphilis he suffered from 10 years ago.

Dr. B offers reasons that explain why A’s uncle has paresis. It is unreasonable to think that B believes that the uncle’s being a syphilis victim makes it more likely than not that he has paresis, since B admits that having syphilis does not make it more likely than not that someone has (or will have) paresis. So, B’s response does not contain an argument, because (ii) is not satisfied.

A: I don’t think that Bill will be at the party tonight.

B: Bill will be at the party, because Bill will be at the party.

Suppose that B believes that Bill will be at the party. Trivially, the truth of this proposition makes it more likely than not that he will be at the party. Nevertheless, B is not presenting an argument.  B’s response does not have the structure of an argument, because (iiia) is not satisfied. Clearly, B does not offer a reason for Bill will be at the party that is independent of this. Perhaps, B’s response is intended to communicate her confidence that Bill will be at the party. By (iiia), a reasoner R puts forward [1] Sasha Obama has a sibling in support of [2] Sasha is not an only child only if R’s reasons for believing [1] do not include R’s belief that [2] is true. If R puts forward [1] in support of [2] and, say, erroneously believes that the former is independent of the latter, then R’s argument would be defective by virtue of being circular. Regarding (iiib), that Obama is U.S. President entails that the earth is the third planet from the sun or it isn’t, but it is plausible to suppose that the former does not support the latter because it is irrelevant to showing that the earth is the third planet from the sun or it isn’t is true.

Premises offered in support of a conclusion are either linked or convergent. This difference marks a structural distinction between arguments.

[1] Tom is happy only if he is playing guitar.
[2] Tom is not playing guitar.
———————————————————————
[3] Tom is not happy.

Suppose that a reasoner R offers [1] and [2] as reasons in support of [3]. The argument is presented in what is called standard form; the premises are listed first and a solid line separates them from the conclusion, which is prefaced by “”. This symbol means “therefore”. Premises [1] and [2] are linked because they do not support the conclusion independently of one another,  that is, they support the conclusion jointly. It is unreasonable to think that R offers [1] and [2] individually, as opposed to collectively, as reasons for [3]. The following representation of the argument depicts the linkage of the premises.

Combining [1] and [2] with the plus sign and underscoring them indicates that they are linked. The arrow indicates that they are offered in support of [3]. To see a display of convergent premises, consider the following.

[1] Tom said that he didn’t go to Samantha’s party.
[2] No one at Samantha’s party saw Tom there.
——————————————————————————
[3] Tom did not attend Samantha’s party.

These premises are convergent, because each is a reason that supports [3] independently of the other. The below diagram represents this.

An extended argument is an argument with at least one premise that a reasoner attempts to support explicitly. Extended arguments are more structurally complex than ones that are not extended. Consider the following.

The keys are either in the kitchen or the bedroom. The keys are not in the kitchen. I did not find the keys in the kitchen. So, the keys must be in the bedroom. Let’s look there!

The argument in standard form may be portrayed as follows:

[1] I just searched the kitchen and I did not find the keys.
—————————————————————————————
[2] The keys are not in the kitchen.
[3] The keys are either in the kitchen or the bedroom.
————————————————————————————
[4] The keys are in the bedroom.

Note that although the keys being in the bedroom is a reason for the imperative, “Let’s look there!” (given the desirability of finding the keys), this proposition is not “truth apt” and so is not a component of the argument.

An enthymeme is an argument which is presented with at least one component that is suppressed.

A: I don’t know what to believe regarding the morality of abortion.

B: You should believe that abortion is immoral. You’re a Catholic.

That B puts forward [1] A is a Catholic in support of [2] A should believe that abortion is immoral suggests that B implicitly puts forward [3] all Catholics should believe that abortion is immoral in support of [2]. Proposition [3] may plausibly be regarded as a suppressed premise of B’s argument. Note that [2] and [3] are linked. A premise that is suppressed is never a reason for a conclusion independent of another explicitly offered for that conclusion.

There are two main criticisms of structural characterizations of arguments. One criticism is that they are too weak because they turn non-arguments such as explanations into arguments.

A: Why did this metal expand?

B: It was heated and all metals expand when heated.

B offers explanatory reasons for the explanandum (what is explained): this metal expanded. It is plausible to see B offering these explanatory reasons in support of the explanandum. The reasons B offers jointly support the truth of the explanandum, and thereby show that the expansion of the metal was to be expected. It is in this way that B’s reasons enable A to understand why the metal expanded.

The second criticism is that structural characterizations are too strong. They rule out as arguments what intuitively seem to be arguments.

A: Kelly maintains that no explanation is an argument. I don’t know what to believe.

B: Neither do I. One reason for her view may be that the primary function of arguments, unlike explanations, is persuasion. But I am not sure that this is the primary function of arguments. We should investigate this further.

B offers a reason, [1] the primary function of arguments, unlike explanations, is persuasion, for the thesis [2] no explanation is an argument. Since B asserts neither [1] nor [2], B does not put forward [1] in support of [2]. Hence, by the above account, B’s reasoning does not qualify as an argument. A contrary view is that arguments can be used in ways other than showing that their conclusions are true. For example, arguments can be constructed for purposes of inquiry and as such can be used to investigate a hypothesis by seeing what reasons might be given to support a given proposition (see Meiland 1989 and Johnson and Blair 2006, p.10). Such arguments are sometimes referred to as exploratory arguments.  On this approach, it is plausible to think that B constructs an exploratory argument [exercise for the reader: identify B’s suppressed premise].

Briefly, in defense of the structuralist account of arguments one response to the first criticism is to bite the bullet and follow those who think that at least some explanations qualify as arguments (see Thomas 1986 who argues that all explanations are arguments). Given that there are exploratory arguments, the second criticism motivates either liberalizing the concept of support that premises may provide for a conclusion (so that, for example, B may be understood as offering [1] in support of [2]) or dropping the notion of support all together in the structural characterization of arguments (for example, a collection of propositions is an argument if and only if a reasoner offers some as reasons for one of them. See Sinnott-Armstrong and Fogelin 2010, p.3).

2. The Pragmatic Approach to Characterizing Arguments

The pragmatic approach is motivated by the view that the nature of an argument cannot be completely captured in terms of its structure. In contrast to structural definitions of arguments, pragmatic definitions appeal to the function of arguments. Different accounts of the purposes arguments serve generate different pragmatic definitions of arguments. The following pragmatic definition appeals to the use of arguments as tools of rational persuasion (for definitions of argument that make such an appeal, see Johnson 2000, p. 168; Walton 1996, p. 18ff; Hitchcock 2007, p.105ff)

A collection of propositions is an argument if and only if there is a reasoner R who puts forward some of them (the premises) as reasons in support of one of them (the conclusion) in order to rationally persuade an audience of the truth of the conclusion.

One advantage of this definition over the previously given structural one is that it offers an explanation why arguments have the structure they do. In order to rationally persuade an audience of the truth of a proposition, one must offer reasons in support of that proposition. The appeal to rational persuasion is necessary to distinguish arguments from other forms of persuasion such as threats. One question that arises is: What obligations does a reasoner incur by virtue of offering supporting reasons for a conclusion in order to rationally persuade an audience of the conclusion? One might think that such a reasoner should be open to criticisms and obligated to respond to them persuasively (See Johnson 2000 p.144 et al, for development of this idea). By appealing to the aims that arguments serve, pragmatic definitions highlight the acts of presenting an argument in addition to the arguments themselves. The field of argumentation, an interdisciplinary field that includes rhetoric, informal logic, psychology, and cognitive science, highlights acts of presenting arguments and their contexts as topics for investigation that inform our understanding of arguments (see Houtlosser 2001 for discussion of the different perspectives of argument offered by different fields).

For example, the acts of explaining and arguing—in sense highlighted here—have different aims.  Whereas the act of explaining is designed to increase the audience’s comprehension, the act of arguing is aimed at enhancing the acceptability of a standpoint. This difference in aim makes sense of the fact that in presenting an argument the reasoner believes that her standpoint is not yet acceptable to her audience, but in presenting an explanation the reasoner knows or believes that the explanandum is already accepted by her audience (See van Eemeren and Grootendorst 1992, p.29, and Snoeck Henkemans 2001, p.232). These observations about the acts of explaining and arguing motivate the above pragmatic definition of an argument and suggest that arguments and explanations are distinct things. It is generally accepted that the same line of reasoning can function as an explanation in one dialogical context and as an argument in another (see Groarke and Tindale 2004, p. 23ff for an example and discussion). Eemeren van, Grootendorst, and Snoeck Henkemans 2002 delivers a substantive account of how the evaluation of various types of arguments turns on considerations pertaining to the dialogical contexts within which they are presented and discussed.

Note that, since the pragmatic definition appeals to the structure of propositions in characterizing arguments, it inherits the criticisms of structural definitions. In addition, the question arises whether it captures the variety of purposes arguments may serve. It has been urged that arguments can aim at engendering any one of a full range of attitudes towards their conclusions (for example, Pinto 1991). For example, a reasoner can offer premises for a conclusion C in order to get her audience to withhold assent from C, suspect that C is true, believe that is merely possible that C is true, or to be afraid that C is true.

The thought here is that these are alternatives to convincing an audience of the truth of C. A proponent of a pragmatic definition of argument may grant that there are uses of arguments not accounted for by her definition, and propose that the definition is stipulative. But then a case needs to be made why theorizing about arguments from a pragmatic approach should be anchored to such a definition when it does not reflect all legitimate uses of arguments. Another line of criticism of the pragmatic approach is its rejecting that arguments themselves have a function (Goodwin 2007) and arguing that the function of persuasion should be assigned to the dialogical contexts in which arguments take place (Doury 2011).

3. Deductive, Inductive, and Conductive Arguments

Arguments are commonly classified as deductive or inductive (for example, Copi, I. and C. Cohen 2005, Sinnott-Armstrong and Fogelin 2010). A deductive argument is an argument that an arguer puts forward as valid. For a valid argument, it is not possible for the premises to be true with the conclusion false. That is, necessarily if the premises are true, then the conclusion is true. Thus we may say that the truth of the premises in a valid argument guarantees that the conclusion is also true. The following is an example of a valid argument: Tom is happy only if the Tigers win, the Tigers lost; therefore, Tom is definitely not happy.

A step-by-step derivation of the conclusion of a valid argument from its premises is called a proof. In the context of a proof, the given premises of an argument may be viewed as initial premises. The propositions produced at the steps leading to the conclusion are called derived premises. Each step in the derivation is justified by a principle of inference. Whether the derived premises are components of a valid argument is a difficult question that is beyond the scope of this article.

An inductive argument is an argument that an arguer puts forward as inductively strong. In an inductive argument, the premises are intended only to be so strong that, if they were true, then it would be unlikely, although possible, that the conclusion is false. If the truth of the premises makes it unlikely (but not impossible) that the conclusion is false, then we may say that the argument is inductively strong. The following is an example of an inductively strong argument: 97% of the Republicans in town Z voted for McX, Jones is a Republican in town Z; therefore, Jones voted for McX.

In an argument like this, an arguer often will conclude "Jones probably voted for McX" instead of "Jones voted for McX," because they are signaling with the word "probably" that they intend to present an argument that is inductively strong but not valid.

In order to evaluate an argument it is important to determine whether or not it is deductive or inductive. It is inappropriate to criticize an inductively strong argument for being invalid. Based on the above characterizations, whether an argument is deductive or inductive turns on whether the arguer intends the argument to be valid or merely inductively strong, respectively. Sometimes the presence of certain expressions such as ‘definitely’ and ‘probably’ in the above two arguments indicate the relevant intensions of the arguer. Charity dictates that an invalid argument which is inductively strong be evaluated as an inductive argument unless there is clear evidence to the contrary.

Conductive arguments have been put forward as a third category of arguments (for example, Govier 2010). A conductive argument is an argument whose premises are convergent; the premises count separately in support of the conclusion. If one or more premises were removed from the argument, the degree of support offered by the remaining premises would stay the same. The previously given example of an argument with convergent premises is a conductive argument. The following is another example of a conductive argument. It most likely won’t rain tomorrow. The sky is red tonight. Also, the weather channel reported a 30% chance of rain for tomorrow.

The primary rationale for distinguishing conductive arguments from deductive and inductive ones is as follows. First, the premises of conductive arguments are always convergent, but the premises of deductive and inductive arguments are never convergent. Second, the evaluation of arguments with convergent premises requires not only that each premise be evaluated individually as support for the conclusion, but also the degree to which the premises support the conclusion collectively must be determined. This second consideration mitigates against treating conductive arguments merely as a collection of subarguments, each of which is deductive or inductive. The basic idea is that the support that the convergent premises taken together provide the conclusion must be considered in the evaluation of a conductive argument. With respect to the above conductive argument, the sky is red tonight and the weather channel reported a 30% chance of rain for tomorrow are offered together as (convergent) reasons for It most likely won’t rain tomorrow. Perhaps, collectively, but not individually, these reasons would persuade an addressee that it most likely won’t rain tomorrow.

4. Conclusion

A group of propositions constitutes an argument only if some are offered as reasons for one of them. Two approaches to identifying the definitive characteristics of arguments are the structural and pragmatic approaches. On both approaches, whether an act of offering reasons for a proposition P yields an argument depends on what the reasoner believes regarding both the truth of the reasons and the relationship between the reasons and P. A typical use of an argument is to rationally persuade its audience of the truth of the conclusion. To be effective in realizing this aim, the reasoner must think that there is real potential in the relevant context for her audience to be rationally persuaded of the conclusion by means of the offered premises. What, exactly, this presupposes about the audience depends on what the argument is and the context in which it is given. An argument may be classified as deductive, inductive, or conductive. Its classification into one of these categories is a prerequisite for its proper evaluation.

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Author Information

Matthew McKeon
Email: mckeonm@msu.edu
Michigan State University
U. S. A.