Aristotle: Biology


Aristotle (384-322 BCE.) may be said to be the first biologist in the Western tradition. Though there are physicians and other natural philosophers who remark on various flora and fauna before Aristotle, none of them brings to his study a systematic critical empiricism. Aristotle’s biological science is important to understand, not only because it gives us a view into the history and philosophy of science, but also because it allows us more deeply to understand his non-biological works, since certain key concepts from Aristotle’s biology repeat themselves in his other writings. Since a significant portion of the corpus of Aristotle’s work is on biology, it is natural to expect his work in biology to resonate in his other writings. One may, for example, use concepts from the biological works to better understand the ethics or metaphysics of Aristotle.

This article will begin with a brief explanation of his biological views and move toward several key explanatory concepts that Aristotle employs. These concepts are essential because they stand as candidates for a philosophy of biology. If Aristotle’s principles are insightful, then he has gone a long way towards creating the first systematic and critical system of biological thought. It is for this reason (rather than the particular observations themselves) that moderns are interested in Aristotle’s biological writings.

Table of Contents

  1. His Life
  2. The Scope of Aristotle’s Biological Works
  3. The Specialist and the Generalist
  4. The Two Modes of Causal Explanation
  5. Aristotle’s Theory of Soul
  6. The Biological Practice: Outlines of a Systematics
  7. “The more and the less” and “Epi to polu”
  8. Significant Achievements and Mistakes
  9. Conclusion
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Text
    2. Key Texts in Translation
    3. Selected Secondary Sources

1. His Life

Aristotle was born in the year 384 B.C. in the town of Stagira (the modern town Stavros), a coastal Macedonian town to the north of Greece. He was raised at the court of Amyntas where he probably met and was friends with Philip (later to become king and father to Alexander, the Great). When Aristotle was around 18, he was sent to Athens to study in Plato’s Academy. Aristotle spent twenty years at the Academy until Plato’s death, although Diogenes says Aristotle left before Plato’s death. When Plato was succeeded by his nephew, Speusippus, as head of the Academy, Aristotle accepted an invitation to join a former student, Hermeias, who was gathering a Platonic circle about him in Assos in Mysia (near Troy). Aristotle spent three years in this environment. During this time, he may have done some of the natural investigations that later became The History of Animals.

At the end of Aristotle’s stay in Mysia, he moved to Lesbos (an adjacent island). This move may have been prompted by Theophrastus, a fellow of the Academy who was much influenced by Aristotle. It is probable (according to D’Arcy Thompson) that Aristotle performed some important biological investigations during this period.

Aristotle returned to Athens (circa 334-5). This began a period of great productivity. He rented some grounds in woods sacred to Apollo. It was here that Aristotle set-up his school (Diog. Laert V, 51).

At his school Aristotle also accumulated a large number of manuscripts and created a library that was a model for later libraries in Alexandria and Pergamon. According to one tradition, Alexander (his former pupil) paid him a handsome sum of money each year as a form of gratitude (as well as some exotic animals for Aristotle to study that Alexander encountered in his conquests).

At the death of Alexander in 323, Athens once again was full of anti-Macedonian sentiment. A charge of impiety was brought against Aristotle due to a poem he had written for Hermeias. One martyr for philosophy (Socrates) was enough for Aristotle and so he left his school to his colleague, Theophrastus, and fled to the Macedonian Chalcis. Here in 322 he died of a disease that is still the subject of speculation.

2. The Scope of Aristotle’s Biological Works

There is some dispute as to which works should be classified as the biological works of Aristotle. This is indeed a contentious question that is especially difficult for a systematic philosopher such as Aristotle. Generally speaking, a systematic philosopher is one who constructs various philosophical distinctions that, in turn, can be applied to a number of different contexts. Thus, a distinction such as “the more and the less” that has its roots in biology explaining that certain animal parts are greater (bigger) among some individuals and smaller among others, can also be used in the ethics as a cornerstone of the doctrine of the mean as a criterion for virtue. That is, one varies from the mean by the principle of the more and the less. For example, if courage is the mean, then the defect of excess would be “foolhardiness” while the defect of paucity would be “cowardice.” The boundary between what we’d consider “biology” proper vs. what we’d think of as psychology, philosophy of mind, and metaphysics is often hard to draw in Aristotle. That’s because Aristotle’s understanding of biology informs his metaphysics and philosophy of mind, but likewise, he often uses the distinctions drawn in his metaphysics in order to deal with biological issues.

In this article, the biological works are: (a) works that deal specifically with biological topics such as: The Parts of Animals (PA), The Generation of Animals (GA), The History of Animals (HA), The Movement of Animals, The Progression of Animals, On Sense and Sensible Objects, On Memory and Recollection, On Sleep and Waking, On Dreams, On Prophecy in Sleep, On Length and Shortness of Life, On Youth and Old Age, On Life and Death, On Respiration, On Breath, and On Plants, and  (b) the work that deals with psuche (soul), On the Soul—though this work deals with metaphysical issues very explicitly, as well. This list does not include works such as the Metaphysics, Physics, Posterior Analytics, Categories, Nicomachean Ethics, or The Politics even though they contain many arguments that are augmented by an understanding of Aristotle’s biological science. Nor does this article examine any of the reputedly lost works (listed by ancient authors but not existing today) such as Dissections, On Composite Animals, On Sterility, On Physiognomy, and On Medicine . Some of these titles may have sections that have survived in part within the present corpus, but this is doubtful.

3. The Specialist and the Generalist

The distinction between the specialist and the generalist is a good starting point for understanding Aristotle’s philosophy of biology. The specialist is one who has a considerable body of experience in practical fieldwork while the generalist is one who knows many different areas of study. This distinction is brought out in Book One of the Parts of Animals (PA). At PA 639a 1-7 Aristotle says,

In all study and investigation, be it exalted or mundane, there appear to be two types of proficiency: one is that of exact, scientific knowledge while the other is a generalist’s understanding. (my tr.)

Aristotle does not mean to denigrate or to exalt either. Both are necessary for natural investigations. The generalist’s understanding is holistic and puts some area of study into a proper genus, while scientific knowledge deals with causes and definitions at the level of the species. These two skills are demonstrated by the following example:

An example of what I mean is the question of whether one should take a single species and state its differentia independently, for example, homo sapiens nature or the nature of Lions or Oxen, etc., or should we first set down common attributes or a common character (PA 639a 15-19, my tr.).

In other words, the methodology of the specialist would be to observe and catalogue each separate species by itself. The generalist, on the other hand, is drawn to making more global connections through an understanding of the common character of many species. Both skills are needed. Here and elsewhere Aristotle demonstrates the limitations of a single mode of discovery. We cannot simply set out a single path toward scientific investigation—whether it be demonstrative (logical) exactness (the specialist’s understanding) or holistic understanding (the generalist’s knowledge). Neither direction (specialist or generalist) is the one and only way to truth. Really, it is a little of both working in tandem. Sometimes one half takes the lead and sometimes the other. The adoption of several methods is a cornerstone of Aristotelian pluralism, a methodological principle that characterizes much of his work.

When discussing biological science, Aristotle presents the reader two directions: (a) the modes of discovery (genetic order) and (b) the presentation of a completed science (logical order). In the mode of discovery, the specialist sets out all the phenomena in as much detail as possible while the generalist must use her inter-generic knowledge to sort out what may or may not be significant in the event taking place before her. This is because in the mode of discovery, the investigator is in the genetic order. Some possible errors that could be made in this order (for example) might be mistaking certain animal behaviors for an end for which they were not intended. For example, it is very easy to mistake mating behavior for aggressive territorial behavior. Since the generalist has seen many different types of animals, she may be in the best position (on the basis of generic analogy) to classify the sort of behavior in question.

In the mode of discovery one begins with the phenomenon and then seeks to create a causal explanation (PA 646a 25). But how does one go about doing this? In the Posterior Analytics II.19, Aristotle suggests a process of induction that begins with the particular and then moves to the universal. Arriving at the universal entails a comprehensive understanding of some phenomenon. For example, if one wanted to know whether fish sleep, one would first observe fish in their environment. If one of the behaviors of the fish meets the common understanding of sleep (such as being deadened to outside stimulus, showing little to no movement, and so forth), then one may move to the generalization that fish sleep (On Sleeping and Waking 455b 8, cf. On Dreams 458b 9). But one cannot stop there. Once one has determined that fish sleep (via the inductive mode of discovery), it is now up to the researcher to ferret out the causes and reasons why, in a systematic fashion. This second step is the mode of presentation. In this mode the practitioner of biological science seeks to understand why the universal is as it is. Going back to the example of sleeping fish, the scientist would ask why fish need to sleep. Is it by analogy to humans and other animals that seem to gather strength through sleep? What ways might sleep be dangerous (say by opening the individual fish to being eaten)? What do fish do to avoid this?

These, and other questions require the practitioner to work back and forth with what has been set down in the mode of discovery for the purpose of providing an explanation. The most important tools for this exercise are the two modes of causal explanation.

4. The Two Modes of Causal Explanation

For Aristotle there are four causes: material, efficient, formal, and final. The material cause is characterized as “That out of which something existing becomes” (Phys. 194b 24). The material has the potential for the range of final products. Within the material is, in a potential sense, that which is to be formed. Obviously, one piece of wood or metal has the potential to be many artifacts; yet the possibilities are not infinite. The material itself puts constraint upon what can be produced from it. One can execute designs in glass, for example, which could never be brought forth from brass.

The efficient cause is depicted as “that from whence comes the first principle of kinetic change or rest” (Phys. 194b 30). Aristotle gives the example of a male fathering a child as showing an efficient cause. The efficient cause is the trigger that starts a process moving.

The formal cause constitutes the essence of something while the final cause is the purpose of something. For example, Aristotle believed the tongue to be for the purpose of either talking or not. If the tongue was for the purpose of talking (final cause), then it had to be shaped in a certain way, wide and supple so that it might form subtle differences in sound (formal cause). In this way the purpose of the tongue for speaking dovetails with the structural way it might be brought about (P.A. 660a 27-32).

It is generally the case that Aristotle in his biological science interrelates the final and formal causes. For example Aristotle says that the efficient cause may be inadequate to explain change. In the On Generation and Corruption 336a Aristotle states that all natural efficient causes are regulated by formal causes. “It is clear then that fire itself acts and is acted upon.” What this means is that while the fire does act as efficient cause, the manner of this action is regulated by a formal/final cause. The formal cause (via the doctrine of natural place—that arranges an ascending hierarchy among the elements, earth, water, air and fire) dictates that fire is the highest level of the sub-lunar phenomena. Thus, its essence defines its purpose, namely, to travel upward toward its own natural place. In this way the formal and final cause act together to guide the actions of fire (efficient cause) to point upward toward its natural place.

Aristotle (at least in the biological works) invokes a strategy of redundant explanation. Taken at its simplest level, he gives four accounts of everything. However, in the actual practice, it comes about that he really only offers two accounts. In the first account he presents a case for understanding an event via material/kinetic means. For the sake of simplicity, let us call this the ME (materially-based causal explanation) account.

In the second case he presents aspects of essence (formal cause) and purpose (final cause). These are presented together. For the sake of simplicity, let us call this the TE (teleologically-based causal explanation) account. For an example of how these work together, consider respiration.

Aristotle believes that material and efficient causes can give one account of the motions of the air in and out of the lungs for respiration. But this is only part of the story. One must also consider the purpose of respiration and how this essence affects the entire organism (PA 642a 31-642b 4). Thus the combination of the efficient and material causes are lumped together as one sort of explanation ME that focus upon how the nature of hot and cold air form a sort of current that brings in new air and exhales the old. The final and formal causes are linked together as another sort of explanation TE that is tied to why we have respiration in the first place.

In Aristotle’s account respiration we are presented with a partner to TE and ME: necessity. When necessity attaches itself to ME it is called simple or absolute necessity. When necessity attaches itself to TE it is called conditional necessity. Let us return to our example of respiration and examine these concepts in more detail.

First, then there is the formal/final cause of respiration. Respiration exists so that air might be brought into the body for the creation of pneuma (a vital force essential for life). If there were no respiration, there would be no intake of air and no way for it to be heated in the region of the heart and turned intopneuma—an element necessary for life among the blooded animals who live out of water. Thus the TE for respiration is for the sake of producing an essential raw material for the creation of pneuma.

The second mode of explanation, ME, concerns the material and efficient causes related to respiration. These have to do with the manner of a quasi-gas law theory. The hot air in the lungs will tend to stay there unless it is pushed out by the cold incoming air that hurries its exit (cf. On Breath 481b 11). (This is because ‘hot’ and ‘cold’ are two of the essential contraries hot/cold & wet/dry). It is the material natures of the elements that dictate its motions. This is the realm of the ME.

ME is an important mode of explanation because it grounds the practitioner in the empirical facts so that he may not incline himself to offer mere a priori causal accounts. When one is forced to give material and kinetic accounts of some event, then one is grounded in the tangible dynamics of what is happening. This is one important requirement for knowledge.

Now to necessity. Necessity can be represented as a modal operator that can attach itself to either TE or to ME. When it attaches itself to TE, the result is conditional necessity. In conditional necessity one must always begin with the end to be achieved. For example, if one assumes the teleological assumption of natural efficiency, Nature does nothing in vain (GA 741b 5, cf. 739b20, et. al.) then the functions of various animal parts must be viewed within that frame. If we know that respiration is necessary for life, then what animal parts are necessary to allow respiration within different species? The acceptance of the end of respiration causes the investigator to account for how it can occur within a species. The same could be said for other given ends such as “gaining nutrition,” “defending one’s self from attack,” and “reproduction,” among others. When the biologist begins his investigation with some end (whether in the mode of discovery or the mode of scientific presentation), he is creating an account of conditional necessity.

The other sort of necessity is absolute necessity that is the result of matter following its nature (such as fire moving to its natural place). The very nature of the material, itself, creates the dynamics—such as the quasi gas law interactions between the hot and cold air in the lungs. These dynamics may be described without proximate reference to the purpose of the event. In this way ME can function by itself along with simple necessity to give one complete account of an event.

In biological science Aristotle believes that conditional necessity is the most useful of the two necessities in discovery and explanation (PA 639b 25). This is because, in biology, there is a sense that the entire explanation always requires the purpose to set out the boundaries of what is and what is not significant. However, in his practice it is most often the case that Aristotle employs two complete accounts ME and TE in order to reveal different modes of explanation according to his doctrine of pluralism.

5. Aristotle’s Theory of Soul

The word for ‘soul’ in Aristotle is psuche. In Latin it is translated as anima. For many readers, it is the use of the Latin term (particularly as it was used by Christian, Moslem, and Jewish theologians) that forms the basis of our modern understanding of the word. Under the theological tradition, the soul meant an immaterial, detached ruling power within a human. It was immortal and went to God after death. This tradition gave rise to Descartes’ metaphysical dualism: the doctrine that there are two sorts of things that exist (soul and matter), and that soul ruled matter.

Aristotle does not think of soul as the aforementioned theologians do. This is because matter (hyle) and shape (morphe) combine to create a unity not a duality. The philosopher can intellectually abstract out the separate constituents, but in reality they are always united. This unity is often termed hylomorphism (after its root words). Using the terminology of the last section we can identify hyle with ME and morphe with TE. Thus, Aristotle’s doctrine of the soul (understood as hylomorphism) represents a unity of form and function within matter.

From the biological perspective, soul demarcates three sorts of living things: plants, animals, and human beings. In this way soul acts as the cause of a body’s being alive (De An 415b 8). This amalgamation (soul and body) exhibits itself through the presentation of a particular power that characterizes what it means to be alive for that sort of living thing.

The soul is the form of a living body thus constituting its first actuality. Together the body and soul form an amalgamation. This is because when we analyze the whole into its component parts the particular power of the amalgamation is lost. Matter without TE, as we have seen, acts through the nature of its elements (earth, air, fire, and water) and not for its organic purpose. An example that illustrates the relationship between form and matter is the human eye. When an eye is situated in a living body, the matter (and the motions of that matter) of the eye works with the other parts of the body to present the actualization of a particular power: sight. When governed by the actuality (or fulfillment) of its purpose, an eyeball can see (De An 412b 17). Both the matter of the eyeball and its various neural connections (hyle, understood as ME) along with the formal and final causes (morphe, understood as TE) are necessary for sight. Each part has its particular purpose, and that purpose is given through its contribution to the basic tasks associated with essence of the sort of thing in question: plant, animal, human.

It is important not to slip into the theological cum Cartesian sense of anima here. To say that plants and animals have souls is not to assert that there is a Divine rose garden or hound Heaven. We must remember that soul for Aristotle is a hylomorphic unity representing a monism and not a dualism. (The rational soul’s status is less clear since it is situated in no particular organ since Aristotle rejected the brain as the organ of thinking relegating it to a cooling mechanism, PA652b 21-25). It is the dynamic, vital organizing principle of life—nothing more, nothing less.

Plants exhibit the most basic power that living organisms possess: nutrition and reproduction (De An 414a 31). The purpose of a plant is to take in and process materials in such a way that the plant grows. Several consequences follow (for the most part) from an individual plant having a well-operating nutritive soul. Let’s examine one sort of plant, a tree. If a plant exhibits excellence in taking in and processing nutrition it will exhibit various positive effects. First, the tree will have tallness and girth that will see it through different weather conditions. Second, it will live longer. Third, it will drop lots of seeds giving rise to other trees. Thus, if we were to compare two individual trees (of the same species), and one was tall and robust while the other was small and thin, then we would be able to render a judgment about the two individual trees on the basis of their fulfillment of their purpose as plants within that species. The tall and robust tree of that species would be a better tree (functionally). The small and thin tree would be condemned as failing to fulfill its purpose as a plant within that species.

Animals contain the nutritive soul plus some of the following powers: appetite, sensation, and locomotion (De An 414a 30, 414b 1-415a 13). Now, not all animals have all the same powers. For example, some (like dogs) have a developed sense of smell, while others (like cats) have a developed ability to run quickly with balance. This makes simple comparisons between species more difficult, but within one species the same sort of analysis used with plants also holds. That is, between two individual dogs one dog can (for example) smell his prey up to 200 meters away while the other dog can only detect his prey up to 50 meters. (This assumes that being able to detect prey from a distance allows the individual to eat more often.) The first dog is better because he has fulfilled his soul’s function better than the second. The first dog is thus a good dog while the second a bad example of one. What is important here is that animals judged as animals must fulfill that power (soul) particular to it specifically in order to be functionally excellent. This means that dogs (for example) are proximately judged on their olfactory sense and remotely upon their ability to take in nutrition and to reproduce.

Humans contain the nutritive soul and the appetitive-sensory-locomotive souls along with the rational soul. This power is given in a passive, active, and imaginative sense (De An III 3-5). What this means is that first there is a power in the rational soul to perceive sensation and to process it in such a way that it is intelligible. Next, one is able to use the data received in the first step as material for analysis and reflection. This involves the active agency of the mind. Finally, the result (having both a sensory and ratiocinative element) can be arranged in a novel fashion so that the universal mixes with the perceived particular. This is imagination (De An III.3). For example, one might perceive in step-one that your door is hanging at a slant. In step-two you examine the hinges and ponder why the door is hanging in just this way. Finally, in step-three you consider types of solutions that might solve the problem—such as taking a plane to the top of the door, or inserting a “shim” behind one of the hinges. You make your decision about this door in front of you based upon your assessment of the various generic solutions.

The rational soul, thus understood as a multi-step imaginative process, gives rise to theoretical and practical knowledge that, in turn, have other sub-divisions (EN VI). Just as the single nutritive soul of plants was greatly complicated by the addition of souls for the animals, so also is the situation even more complicated with the addition of the rational soul for humans. This is because it has so many different applications. For example, one person may know right and wrong and can act on this knowledge and create habits of the same while another may have productive knowledge of an artist who is able to master the functional requirements of his craft in order to produce well-wrought artifacts. Just as it is hard to compare cats and dogs among animal souls, so it is difficult to judge various instantiations of excellence among human rational souls. However, it is clear that between two persons compared on their ethical virtues and two artists compared on their productive wisdom, we may make intra-category judgments about each. These sorts of judgments begin with a biological understanding of what it means to be a human being and how one may fulfill her biological function based on her possession of the human rational soul (understood in one of the sub-categories of reason). Again, a biological understanding of the soul has implications beyond the field of biology/psychology.

6. The Biological Practice: Outlines of a Systematics

Systematics is the study of how one ought to create a system of biological classification and thus perform taxonomy. (“Systematics” is not to be confused with being a “systematic philosopher.” The former term has a technical meaning related to the theoretical foundations of animal classification and taxonomy. The latter phrase has to do with a tightly structured interlocking philosophical account.) In Aristotle’s logical works, he creates a theory of definition. According to Aristotle, the best way to create a definition is to find the proximate group in which the type of thing resides. For example, humans are a type of thing (species) and their proximate group is animal (or blooded animal). The proximate group is called thegenus. Thus the genus is a larger group of which the species is merely one proper subset. What marks off that particular species as unique? This is the differentia or the essential defining trait. In our example with humans the differentia is “rationality.” Thus the definition of “human” is a rational animal. “Human” is the species, “animal” is the genus and “rationality” is the differentia.

In a similar way, Aristotle adapts his logical theory of genus and species to biology. By thinking in terms of species and their proximate genus, Aristotle makes a statement about the connections between various types of animals. Aristotle does not create a full-blown classification system that can describe all animals, but he does lay the theoretical foundations for such.

The first overarching categories are the blooded and the non-blooded animals. The animals covered by this distinction roughly correspond to the modern distinction between vertebrates and invertebrates. There are also two classes of dualizers that are animals that fit somewhat between categories. Here is a sketch of the categorization:

I. Blooded Animals

A. Live bearing animals

1. Homo Sapiens2. Other mammals without a distinction for primates

B. Egg-laying animals

1. Birds2. Fish

I. Non-Blooded Animals

A. Shell skinned sea animals: testaceaB. Soft shelled sea animals: Crustacea

C. Non-shelled soft skinned sea animals: Cephalopods

D. Insects

E. Bees

I. Dualizers (animals that share properties of more than one group)

A. Whales, seals and porpoises—they give live birth yet they live in the seaB. Bats—they have four appendages yet they fly

C. Sponges—they act like both plants and like animals

Aristotle’s proto-system of classification differs from that of his predecessors who used habitat and other non-functional criteria to classify animals. For example, one theory commonly set out three large groups: air, land, and sea creatures. Because of the functional orientation of Aristotle’s TE, Aristotle repudiates any classification system based upon non-functional accidents. What is important is that the primary activities of life are carried out efficiently through specially designated body parts.

Though Aristotle’s work on classification is by no means comprehensive (but is rather a series of reflections on how to create one), it is appropriate to describe it as meta-systematics. Such reflections are consistent with his other key explanatory concepts of functionalism (TE and ME) as well as his work on logic in the Organon with respect to the utilization of genus and species. Though incomplete, this again is a blueprint of how to construct a systematics. The general structure of meta-systematics also acts as an independent principle that permits Aristotle to examine animals together that are functionally similar. Such a move enhances the reliability of analogy as a tool of explanation.

7. “The more and the less” and “Epi to polu”

“The more and the less” is an explanatory concept that is allied to the ME account. Principally, it is a way that individuation occurs in the non-uniform parts. Aristotle distinguishes two sorts of parts in animals: the uniform and the non-uniform. The uniform parts are those that if you dumped them into a bucket and cut the bucket in half, they would still remain the same. For example, blood is a uniform part. Dump blood into a bucket and cut it in half and it’s still the same blood (just half the quantity). The same is true of tissue, cartilage, tendons, skin, et al. Non-uniform parts change when the bucket test is applied. If you dump a lung into a bucket and cut it in half, you no longer have a proper organ. The same holds true of other organs: heart, liver, pancreas, and so forth, as well as the skeleton (Uniform Parts—PA 646b 20, 648b, 650a 20, 650b, 651b 20, 652a 23; Non-Uniform Parts—PA 656b 25, 622a 17, 665b 20, 683a 20, 684a 25.)

When an individual has excess nutrition (trophe), the excess (perittoma) often is distributed all around (GA 734b 25). An external observer does not perceive the changes to the uniform parts—except, perhaps, stomach fat. But such an observer would perceive the difference in a child who has been well fed (whose non-uniform parts are bigger) than one who hasn’t. The difference is accounted for by the principle of the more and the less.

How does an external observer differentiate between any two people? The answer is that the non-uniform parts (particularly the skeletal structure) differ. Thus, one person’s nose is longer, another stands taller, a third is broader in the shoulders, etc. We all have noses, stand within a range of height and broadness of shoulders, etc. The particular mix that we each possess makes us individuals.

Sometimes, this mix goes beyond the range of the species (eidos). In these instances a part becomes non-functional because it has too much material or too little. Such situations are beyond the natural range one might expect within the species. Because of this, the instance involved is characterized as being unnatural (para phusin).

The possibility of unnatural events occurring in nature affects the status of explanatory principles in biology. We remember from above that there are two sorts of necessity: conditional and absolute. The absolute necessity never fails. It is the sort of necessity that one can apply to the stars that exist in the super lunar realm. One can create star charts of the heavens that will be accurate for a thousand years forward or backward. This is because of the mode of absolute necessity.

However, because conditional necessity depends upon its telos, and because of the principle of the more and the less that is non-teleologically (ME) driven, there can arise a sort of spontaneity (cf. automaton, Phys. II.6) that can alter the normal, expected execution of a task because spontaneity is purposeless. In these cases the input from the material cause is greater or lesser than is usually the case. The result is an unnatural outcome based upon the principle of the more and the less. An example of this might be obesity. Nourishment is delivered to the body in a hierarchical fashion beginning with the primary needs. When all biological needs are met, then the excess goes into hair, nails and body fat. Excess body fat can impair proper function, but not out of design.

Because of the possibility of spontaneity and its unintended consequences, the necessary operative in biological events (conditional necessity) is only “for the most part” (hôs epi to polu). We cannot expect biological explanatory principles to be of the same order as those of the stars. Ceteris paribis principles are the best the biological realm can give. This brute fact gives rise to a different set of epistemic expectations than are often raised in the Prior Analytics and the Posterior Analytics. Our expectations for biology are for general rules that are true in most cases but have many exceptions. This means that biology cannot be an exact science, unlike astronomy. If there are always going to be exceptions that are contrary to nature, then the biologist must do his biology with toleration for these sorts of peripheral anomalies. This disposition is characterized by the doctrine of epi to polu.

8. Significant Achievements and Mistakes

This section will highlight a few of Aristotle’s biological achievements from the perspective of over 2,300 years of hindsight. For simplicity’s sake let us break these up into “bad calls” (observations and conclusions that have proven to be wrong) and “good calls” (observations and conclusions that have proven to be very accurate).

We begin with the bad calls: let’s start with a few of Aristotle’s mistakes. First, Aristotle believed that thinking occurred in the region around the heart and not in the brain (a cooling organ, PA 652b 21-25, cf. HA 514a 16-22). Second, Aristotle thought that men were hotter than women (the opposite is the case). Third, Aristotle overweighed the male contribution in reproduction. Fourth, little details are often amiss such as the number of teeth in women. Fifth, Aristotle believed that spontaneous generation could occur. For example, Aristotle observed that from animal dung certain flies could appear (even though careful observation did not reveal any flies mating and laying their eggs in the dung. The possibility of the eggs already existing in the abdomen of the animal did not occur to Aristotle.) However, these sorts of mistakes are more often than not the result of an a priori principle such as “women being colder and less perfectly formed than men” or the application of his method on (in principle) unobservables—such as human conception in which it is posited that the male provides the efficient, formal, and final cause while the woman provides merely the material cause.

Good Calls: Aristotle examined over 500 different species of animals. Some species came from fishermen, hunters, farmers, and perhaps Alexander. Many other species were viewed in nature by Aristotle. There are some very exact observations made by Aristotle during his stay at Lesbos. It is virtually certain that his early dissection skills were utilized solely upon animals (due to the social prohibition on dissecting humans). One example of this comes from the Generation of Animals in which Aristotle breaks open fertilized chicken eggs at carefully controlled intervals to observe when visible organs were generated. The first organ Aristotle saw was the heart. (In fact it is the spinal cord and the beginnings of the nervous system, but this is not visible without employing modern staining techniques.) On eggs opened later, Aristotle saw other organs. This led Aristotle to come out against a popular theory of conception and development entitled, “the pre-formation theory.” In the pre-formation theory, whose advocates extended until the eighteenth century, all the parts appear all at once and development is merely the growth of these essential parts. The contrary theory that Aristotle espouses is the epigenetic theory. According to epigenesis, the parts are created in a nested hierarchical order. Thus, through his observation, Aristotle saw that the heart was formed first, then he postulated that other parts were formed (also backed-up by observation). Aristotle concludes,

I mean, for instance, not that the heart once formed, fashions the liver, and then the liver fashions something else; but that the one is formed after the other (just as man is formed in time after a child), not by it. The reason of this is that so far as the things formed by nature or by human art are concerned, the formation of that which is potentially brought about by that which is in actuality; so that the form of B would have to be contained in A, e.g., the form of liver would have to be in the heart—which is absurd. (GA 734a 28-35, Peck trans.)

In epigenesis the controlling process of development operates according to the TE plan of creating the most important parts first. Since the heart is the principle (arche) of the body, being the center of blood production and sensation/intelligence, it is appropriate that it should be created first. Then other parts such as the liver, etc. are then created in their appropriate order. The epigenesis-preformation debate lasted two thousand years and Aristotle got it right.

Another interesting observation by Aristotle is the discovery of the reproductive mode of the dog shark,Mustelus laevis (HA 6.10, 565b 1ff.). This species is externally viviparous (live bearing) yet internally oviparous (egg bearing). Such an observation could only have come from dissections and careful observations.

Another observation concerns the reproductive habits of cuttlefish. In this process of hectocotylization, the sperm of the Argonauta among other allied species comes in large spermataphores that the male transfers to the mantle cavity of the female. This complicated maneuver, described in HA 524a 4-5, 541b 9-15, cf. 544a 12, GA 720b 33, was not fully verified by moderns until 1959!

Though Aristotle’s observations on bees in HA seems to be entirely from the beekeeper’s point of view (HA 625b7-22), he does note that there are three classes of bees and that sexual reproduction requires that one class give way. He begins his discussion in the Generation of Animals with the following remark, “The generation of bees is beset with many problems” (GA 759a 9). If there are three classes and two genders, then something is amiss. Aristotle goes through what he feels to be all the possibilities. Though the observations are probably second-hand, Aristotle is still able to evaluate the data. He employs his systematic theory using the over-riding meta-principle that Nature always acts in an orderly way (GA 760a 32) to form his explanation of the function of each type of bee. This means that there must be a purposeful process (TE) that guides generation. However, since neither Aristotle nor the beekeepers had ever seen bee copulation, and since Aristotle allows for asexual generation in some fish, he believes that the case of bees offers him another case in which one class is sterile (complies with modern theory on worker bees), another class creates its own kind and another (this is meant to correspond to the Queen bee—that Aristotle calls a King Bee because it has a stinger and females in nature never have defensive weapons), while the third class creates not its own class but another (this is the drone).

Aristotle has got some of this right and some of it wrong. What he has right is first, bees are unusual in having three classes. Second, one class is infertile and works for the good of the whole. Third, one class (the Queen) is a super-reproducer. However, in the case of bees it is Aristotle’s method rather than his results that stirs admiration. Three meta-principles cause particular note:

  1. Reproduction works with two groups not three. The quickest “solution” would have been to make one group sterile and then make the other two male and female. [This would have been the correct response.] However, since none of the beekeepers reported anything like reproductive behavior among bees and because Aristotle’s own limited observations also do not note this, he is reluctant to make such a reply. It is on the basis of the phainomena that Aristotle rejects bee copulation (GA 759a 10).
  2. Aristotle holds that a priori argument alone is not enough. One must square the most likely explanation with the observed facts.
  3. Via analogy, Aristotle notes that some fish seem not to reproduce and even some flies are generated spontaneously. Thus, assigning the roles to the various classes that he does, Aristotle does not create a sui generis instance. By analogy to other suppositions of his biological theory, Aristotle is able to “solve” a troublesome case via reference to analogy. (Aristotle is also admirably cautious about his own theory, saying that more work is needed.)

What is most important in Aristotle’s accomplishments is his combination of keen observations with a critical scientific method that employs his systematic categories to solve problems in biology and then link these to other issues in human life.

9. Conclusion

Since Aristotle’s biological works comprise almost a third of his writings that have come down to us, and since these writings may have occurred early in his career, it is very possible that the influence of the biological works upon Aristotle’s other writings is considerable. Aristotle’s biological works (so often neglected) should be brought to the fore, not only in the history of biology, but also as a way of understanding some of Aristotle’s non-biological writings.

10. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Text

  • Bekker, Immanuel (ed) update by Olof Gigon , Aristotelis Opera. Berlin, Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1831-1870, rpt. W. de Gruyter, 1960-1987.

b. Key Texts in Translation

  • Barnes, Jonathan (ed). The Complete Works of Aristotle: the Revised Oxford Translation. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • The Clarendon Series of Aristotle:
  • Balme, David (tr and ed). Updated by Allan Gotthelf, De Partibus Animalium I with De Generatione Animalium I (with passages from II 1-3). Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1993).
  • Lennox, James G. (tr and ed) Aristotle on the Parts of Animals I-4. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2002.
  • The Loeb Series of Aristotle (opposite pages of Greek and English).

c. Selected Secondary Sources

  • Balme, David. “Aristotle’s Use of Differentiae in Zoology.” Aristote et les Problèms de Méthode.Louvain: Publications Universitaires 1961.
  • Balme, David. “GENOS and EIDOS in Aristotle’s Biology” The Classical Quarterly. 12 (1962): 81-88.
  • Balme, David. “Aristotle’s Biology was not Essentialist” Archiv Für Geschichte der Philosophie. 62.1 (1980): 1-12.
  • Bourgey, Louis. Observation et Experiénce chez Aristote. Paris: J. Vrin, 1955.
  • Boylan, Michael. “Mechanism and Teleology in Aristotle’s Biology” Apeiron 15.2 (1981): 96-102.
  • Boylan, Michael. “The Digestive and ‘Circulatory’ Systems in Aristotle’s Biology” Journal of the History of Biology 15.1 (1982): 89-118.
  • Boylan, Michael. Method and Practice in Aristotle’s Biology. Lanham, MD and London: University Press of America, 1983.
  • Boylan, Michael. “The Hippocratic and Galenic Challenges to Aristotle’s Conception Theory” Journal of the History of Biology 15.1 (1984): 83-112.
  • Boylan, Michael. “The Place of Nature in Aristotle’s Biology” Apeiron 19.1 (1985).
  • Boylan, Michael. “Galen’s Conception Theory” Journal of the History of Biology 19.1 (1986): 44-77.
  • Boylan, Michael. “Monadic and SystemicTEleology” in Modern Problems in Teleology ed. Nicholas Rescher (Washington, D.C.: University Press of America, 1986).
  • Charles, David. Aristotle on Meaning and Essence. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Deverreux, Daniel and Pierre Pellegrin. Eds. Biologie, Logique et Métaphysique chez Aristote. Paris: Éditions du Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique,1990.
  • Düring, Ingemar. Aristotles De Partibus Animalium, Critical and Literary Commentary. Goeteborg, 1943, rpt. NY.: Garland, 1980.
  • Ferejohn, M. The Origins of Aristotelian Science. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1990.
  • Gotthelf, Allan and James G. Lennox, eds. Philosophical Issues in Aristotle’s Biology. NY: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
  • Grene, Marjorie. A Portrait of Aristotle. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1963.
  • Joly, Robert. “La Charactérologie Antique Jusqu’ à Aristote. Revue Belge de Philologie et d’Histoire40 (1962): 5-28.
  • Kullmann, Wolfgang. Wissenscaft und Methode: Interpretationen zur Aristotelischen Theorie der Naturwissenschaft. Berlin: de Gruyter, 1974.
  • Kullmann, Wolfgang. Aristoteles und die moderne Wissenschaft Stuttgart: F. Steiner, 1998.
  • Kullmann, Wolfgang. “Aristotles’ wissenschaftliche Methode in seinen zoologischen Schriften” in Wörhle, G., ed. Geschichte der Mathematik und der Naturwissenschaften. Band 1 Stuttgart: F. Steiner, 1999, pp. 103-123.
  • Kullmann, Wolfgang. “Zoologische Sammelwerk in der Antike” in Wörhle, G., ed. Geschichte der Mathematik und der Naturwissenschaften. Band 1 Stuttgart: F. Steiner 1999, pp. 181-198.
  • Kung, Joan. “Some Aspects of Form in Aristotle’s Biology” Nature and System 2 (1980): 67-90.
  • Kung, Joan. “Aristotle on Thises, Suches and the Third Man Argument” Phronesis 26 (1981): 207-247.
  • Le Blonde, Jean Marie. Aristote, Philosophie de la Vie. Paris: Éditions Montaigne, 1945.
  • Lesher, James. “NOUS in the Parts of Animals.” Phronesis 18 (1973): 44-68.
  • Lennox, James. “Teleology, Chance, and Aristotle’s Theory of Spontaneous Generation” Journal of the History of Philosophy 20 (1982): 219-232.
  • Lennox, James. “The Place of Mankind in Aristotle’s Zoology” Philosophical Topics 25.1 (1999): 1-16.
  • Lennox, James. Aristotle’s Philosophy of Biology: Studies in the Origins of Life Sciences. NY: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. “Right and Left in Greek Philosophy” Journal of Hellenic Studies. 82 (1962): 67-90.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Polarity and Analogy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1966.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Aristotle: The Growth and Structure of his Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1969.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. “Saving the Appearances” Classical Quarterly. n.s. 28 (1978): 202-222.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Magic, Reason, and Experience. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1979.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. The Revolutions of Wisdom. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1987
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Methods and Problems in Greek Science. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Aristotelian Explorations. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Louis, Pierre. “La Génération Spontanée chez Aristote” Congrèss International d’Histoire des Sciences (1968): 291-305.
  • Louis, Pierre. La Découverte de la Vie. Paris: Hermann, 1975.
  • Owen, G.E.L. “TITHENAI TA PHAINOMENA” Aristote et les Problèms de Méthode. Louvain, 1975.
  • Owen, G.E.L. The Platonism of Aristotle. London: British Academy: Dawes Hicks Lecture on Philosophy, 1965.
  • Pellegrin, Pierre. La Classification des Animaux chez Aristote: Statut de la Biologie et Unite de l’Aristotélisme. Paris: Societé d’édition “Les Belles Lettres,” 1982.
  • Pellegrin, Pierre. “Logical Difference and Biological Difference: The Unity of Aristotle’s Thought” in Gotthelf, Allan and James G. Lennox, eds. Philosophical Issues in Aristotle’s Biology. NY: Cambridge University Press, 1987, pp. 313-338.
  • Pellegrin, Pierre. “Taxonomie, moriologie, division” in Deverreux, Daniel and Pierre Pellegrin. Eds.Biologie, Logique et Métaphysique chez Aristote. Paris, 1990, 37-48.
  • Preus, Anthony. “Aristotle’s Parts of Animals 2.16 659b 13-19: Is it Authentic?” Classical Quarterly18.2 (1968): 170-178.
  • Preus, Anthony. “Nature Uses. . . .” Apeiron 3.2 (1969): 20-33.
  • Preus, Anthony. Science and Philosophy in Aristotle’s Biological Works. NY: Olhms, 1975.
  • Preus, Anthony. “Eidos as Norm” Nature and System 1 (1979): 79-103.
  • Solmsen, Friedrich. Aristotle’s System of the Physical World: A Comparison with his Predecessors.Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1960.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Necessity, Cause, and Blame. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1980.
  • Thompson, D’Arcy. Aristotle as Biologist. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1913.
  • Thompson, D’Arcy. Growth and Form. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1917.
  • Ulmer, K. Wahrheit, Kunst und Natur bei Aristotles. Tübingen: M. Niemayer, 1953.
  • Witt, Charlotte. Substance and Essence in Aristotle: An Interpretation of Metaphysics VII-IX.Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1989.
  • Wörhle, Georg and Jochen Althoff, eds. Biologie in Geschichte der Mathematik und der Naturwissenschaften (series). Band 1 Stuttgart: F. Steiner, 1999.

Author Information

Michael Boylan
Marymount University
U. S. A.