Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Aristotle: Logic

Aristotelian logic, after a great and early triumph, consolidated its position of influence to rule over the philosophical world throughout the Middle Ages up until the 19th Century.  All that changed in a hurry when modern logicians embraced a new kind of mathematical logic and pushed out what they regarded as the antiquated and clunky method of syllogisms.  Although Aristotle’s very rich and expansive account of logic differs in key ways from modern approaches, it is more than a historical curiosity.  It provides an alternative way of approaching logic and continues to provide critical insights into contemporary issues and concerns.  The main thrust of this article is to explain Aristotle’s logical system as a whole while correcting some prominent misconceptions that persist in the popular understanding and even in some of the specialized literature.  Before getting down to business, it is important to point out that Aristotle is a synoptic thinker with an over-arching theory that ties together all aspects and fields of philosophy.  He does not view logic as a separate, self-sufficient subject-matter, to be considered in isolation from other aspects of disciplined inquiry.  Although we cannot consider all the details of his encyclopedic approach, we can sketch out the larger picture in a way that illuminates the general thrust of his system.  For the purposes of this entry, let us define logic as that field of inquiry which investigates how we reason correctly (and, by extension, how we reason incorrectly).  Aristotle does not believe that the purpose of logic is to prove that human beings can have knowledge.  (He dismisses excessive scepticism.)  The aim of logic is the elaboration of a coherent system that allows us to investigate, classify, and evaluate good and bad forms of reasoning.

Table of Contents

  1. The Organon
  2. Categories
  3. From Words into Propositions
  4. Kinds of Propositions
  5. Square of Opposition
  6. Laws of Thought
  7. Existential Assumptions
  8. Form versus Content
  9. The Syllogism
  10. Inductive Syllogism
  11. Deduction versus Induction
  12. Science
  13. Non-Discursive Reasoning
  14. Rhetoric
  15. Fallacies
  16. Moral Reasoning
  17. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Organon

To those used to the silver tones of an accomplished writer like Plato, Aristotle’s prose will seem, at first glance, a difficult read.  What we have are largely notes, written at various points in his career, for different purposes, edited and cobbled together by later followers.  The style of the resulting collection is often rambling, repetitious, obscure, and disjointed.  There are many arcane, puzzling, and perhaps contradictory passages.  This problem is compounded by the abstract, technical vocabulary logic sometimes requires and by the wide-ranging scope and the scattered nature of Aristotle’s observations.  Some familiarity with Greek terminology is required if one hopes to capture the nuances in his thought.  Classicists and scholars do argue, of course, about the precise Greek meaning of key words or phrases but many of these debates involve minor points of interpretation that cannot concern us here.  Aristotle’s logical vocabulary needs to be understood within the larger context of his system as a whole.  Many good translations of Aristotle are available.  (Parenthetical citations below include the approximate Bekker number (the scholarly notation for referring to Aristotelian passages according to page, column, and line number of a standard edition), the English title of the work, and the name of the translator.)

Ancient commentators regarded logic as a widely-applicable instrument or method for careful thinking.  They grouped Aristotle’s six logical treatises into a sort of manual they called the Organon (Greek for “tool”).  The Organon included the Categories, On Interpretation, the Prior Analytics, the Posterior Analytics, the Topics, and On Sophistical Refutations.  These books touch on many issues: the logical structure of propositions, the proper structure of arguments (syllogisms), the difference between induction and deduction, the nature of scientific knowledge, basic fallacies (forms of specious reasoning), debating techniques, and so on.  But we cannot confine our present investigations to the Organon.  Aristotle comments on the principle of non-contradiction in the Metaphysics, on less rigorous forms of argument in the Rhetoric, on the intellectual virtues in the Nicomachean Ethics, on the difference between truth and falsity in On the Soul, and so on.  We cannot overlook such important passages if we wish to gain an adequate understanding of Aristotelian logic.

2. Categories

The world, as Aristotle describes it in his Categories, is composed of substances—separate, individual things—to which various characterizations or properties can be ascribed.  Each substance is a unified whole composed of interlocking parts.  There are two kinds of substances.  A primary substance is (in the simplest instance) an independent (or detachable) object, composed of matter, characterized by form.  Individual living organisms—a man, a rainbow trout, an oak tree—provide the most unambiguous examples of primary substances.  Secondary substances are the larger groups, the species or genera, to which these individual organisms belong.  So man, horse, mammals, animals (and so on) would be examples of secondary substances.  As we shall see, Aristotle’s logic is about correctly attributing specific properties to secondary substances (and therefore, indirectly, about attributing these properties to primary substances or individual things).

Aristotle elaborates a logic that is designed to describe what exists in the world.  We may well wonder then, how many different ways can we describe something?  In his Categories (4.1b25-2a4), Aristotle enumerates ten different ways of describing something.  These categories (Greek=kategoria, deriving from the verb to indicate, signify) include (1) substance, (2) quantity, (3) quality, (4) relation, (5) where, (6) when, (7) being-in-a-position, (8) possessing, (9) doing or (10) undergoing something or being affected by something.  In the Topics (I.9, 103b20-25), he includes the same list, replacing “substance” (ousia) with “essence” (ti esti).  We can, along with Aristotle, give an example of each kind of description: (1) to designate something as a “horse” or a “man” is to identify it as a substance or to attribute an essence to it; (2) to say that the wall is four feet long is to describe it in terms of quantity; (3) to say that the roof  is “white” is to ascribe a quality to it; (4) to say that your weight is “double” mine is to describe a relation between the two; (5) to say something happened in the market-place is to explain where; (6) to say it happened last year is to explain when; (7) to say an old man is sitting is to describe his position; (8) to say the girl has shoes on is to describe what she possesses; (9) to say the head chef is cutting a carrot with a knife is to describe what he is doing; and finally, (10) to say wood is being burned in the fireplace is to describe what it means for the wood to undergo burning or to be affected by fire.  Commentators claim that these ten categories represent either different descriptions of being or different kinds of being.  (To be a substance is to be in a certain way; to possess quantity is to be in a certain way; to possess a quality is to be in a certain way, and so on.)  There is nothing magical about the number ten.  Aristotle gives shorter lists elsewhere. (Compare Posterior Analytics, I.22.83a22-24, where he lists seven predications, for example).  Whether Aristotle intends the longer lists as a complete enumeration of all conceivable types of descriptions is an open question.  Scholars have noticed that the first category, substance or essence, seems to be fundamentally different than the others; it is what something is in the most complete and perfect way.

3. From Words into Propositions

Aristotle does not believe that all reasoning deals with words.  (Moral decision-making is, for Aristotle, a form of reasoning that can occur without words.)  Still, words are a good place to begin our study of his logic.  Logic, as we now understand it, chiefly has to do with how we evaluate arguments.  But arguments are made of statements, which are, in turn, made of words.  In Aristotelian logic, the most basic statement is a proposition, a complete sentence that asserts something.  (There are other kinds of sentences—prayers, questions, commands—that do not assert anything true or false about the world and which, therefore, exist outside the purview of logic.)  A proposition is ideally composed of at least three words: a subject (a word naming a substance), a predicate (a word naming a property), and a connecting verb, what logicians call a copula (Latin, for “bond” or “connection”).  Consider the simple statement: “Socrates is wise.”  Socrates is the subject; the property of being wise is the predicate, and the verb “is” (the copula) links Socrates and wisdom together in a single affirmation.  We can express all this symbolically as “S is P” where “S” stands for the subject “Socrates” and “P” stands for the predicate “being wise.”  The sentence “Socrates is wise” (or symbolically, “S is P”) qualifies as a proposition; it is a statement that claims that something is true about the world.  Paradigmatically, the subject would be a (secondary) substance (a natural division of primary substances) and the predicate would be a necessary or essential property as in:  “birds are feathered,” or “triangles have interior angles equal to two right angles,” or “fire is upward-moving.”  But any overly restrictive metaphysical idea about what terms in a proposition mean seems to unnecessarily restrict intelligent discourse.  Suppose someone were to claim that “anger is unethical.”  But anger is not a substance; it is a property of a substance (an organism).  Still, it makes perfect sense to predicate properties of anger.  We can say that anger is unethical, hard to control, an excess of passion, familiar enough, and so on.  Aristotle himself exhibits some flexibility here.  Still, there is something to Aristotle’s view that the closer a proposition is to the metaphysical structure of the world, the more it counts as knowledge.  Aristotle has an all-embracing view of logic and yet believes that, what we could call “metaphysical correctness” produces a more rigorous, scientific form of logical expression.

Of course, it is not enough to produce propositions; what we are after is true propositions.  Aristotle believes that only propositions are true or false.  Truth or falsity (at least with respect to linguistic expression) is a matter of combining words into complete propositions that purport to assert something about the world.  Individual words or incomplete phrases, considered by themselves, are neither true or false.  To say, “Socrates,” or “jumping up and down,” or “brilliant red” is not to assert anything true or false about the world.  It is to repeat words without making any claim about the way things are.  In the Metaphysics, Aristotle provides his own definition of true and false: “to say of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not, is true”; and “to say of what is that it is not, or of what is not that it is, is false.” (IV.7.1011b25, Ross.)  In other words, a true proposition corresponds to way things are.  But Aristotle is not proposing a correspondence theory of truth as an expert would understand it.  He is operating at a more basic level.  Consider the statement: “Spiders have eight legs.”  (Symbolically, “All S is P,” where S, the subject, is “spiders”; P, the predicate, is “the state of being eight-legged,” and the verb “is” functions as the copula.)  What does it mean to say that this claim is true?  If we observe spiders to discover how many legs they have, we will find that (except in a few odd cases) spiders do have eight legs, so the proposition will be true because what it says matches reality.  As we shall see, Aristotle’s logic is designed to produce just this kind of general statement.

4. Kinds of Propositions

Aristotle suggests that all propositions must either affirm or deny something.  Every proposition must be either an affirmation or a negation; it cannot be both.  He also points out that propositions can make claims about what necessarily is the case, about what possibly is the case, or even about what is impossible.  His modal logic, which deals with these further qualifications about possibility or necessity, presents difficulties of interpretation.  We will focus on his assertoric (or non-modal) logic here.  Still, many of Aristotle’s points about necessity and possibility seem highly intuitive.  In one famous example about a hypothetical sea battle, he observes that the necessary truth of a mere proposition does not trump the uncertainty of future events.  Because it is necessarily true that there will be or will not be a sea battle tomorrow, we cannot conclude that either alternative is necessarily true.  (De Interpretatione, 9.19a30ff.)  So the necessity that attaches to the proposition “there will or will not be a sea battle tomorrow” does not transfer over to the claim ‘that there will be a sea battle tomorrow” or to the claim “there will not be a sea battle tomorrow.”  Aristotle goes out of his way to emphasize the point that our personal beliefs about what will happen in the future do not determine whether the individual propositions are true.  (Note that we must not confuse the necessary truth of a proposition with the necessity that precipitates the conclusion of a deductively-valid argument. The former is sometimes called “material,” “non-logical,” or “metaphysical” necessity; the later, “formal,” “deductive,” or “logical” necessity.”  We discuss these issues further below.)

Aristotle claims that all propositions can be expressed using the “Subject copula Predicate” formula and that complex propositions are, on closer inspection, collections of simpler claims that display, in turn, this fundamental structure.  Having fixed the proper logical form of a proposition, he goes on to classify different kinds of propositions.  He begins by distinguishing between particular terms and universal terms.  (The term he uses for “universal” is the Greek “katholou.”)  Particular terms refer to individual things; universal terms refer to groups of things.  The name “Socrates” is a particular term because it refers to a single human being; the word “spiders” is a universal term for it universally applies to all members of the group “spiders.”  Aristotle realizes, of course, that universal terms may be used to refer to parts of a group as well as to entire groups.  We may claim that all spiders have eight legs or that only some spiders have book-lungs.  In the first case, a property, eight-leggedness, is predicated of the entire group referred to by the universal term; in the second case, the property of having book-lungs is predicated of only part of the group.  So, to use Aristotelian language, one may predicate a property universally or not universally of the group referred to by a universal term.

This brings us to Aristotle’s classification of the four different kinds of categorical propositions (called “categorical propositions” because they assert a relationship between two categories or kinds).  Each different categorical proposition possesses quantity insomuch as it represents a universal or a particular predication (referring to all or only some members of the subject class).  It also possesses a definite quality (positive or negative) insomuch as it affirms or denies the specified predication.  The adjectives “all,” “no,” and “some” (which is understood as meaning “at least one”) determine the quantity of the proposition; the quality is determined by whether the verb is in the affirmative or the negative.  Rather than going into the details of Aristotle’s original texts, suffice it to say that contemporary logicians generally distinguish between four logical possibilities:

1.  Universal Affirmation: All S are P (called A statements from the Latin, “AFFIRMO”: I affirm).

2.  Universal Negation: No S are P (called E statements from “NEGO”: I deny).

3.  Particular Affirmation: Some S are P (called I statements from AFFIRMO).

4.  Particular Negation: Some S are not P (called O statements from NEGO).

Note that these four possibilities are not, in every instance, mutually exclusive.  As mentioned above, particular statements using the modifier “some” refer to at least one member of a group.  To say that “some S are P” is to say that “at least one S is P”; to say that “some S are not P” is to say that “at least one S is not P.”  It must follow then (at least on Aristotle’s system) that universal statements require the corresponding particular statement.  If “All S are P,” at least one S must be P; that is, the particular statement “Some S are P” must be true.  Again, if “No S are P,” at least one S must not be P; that is, the particular statement “Some S are not P” must be true.  (More on this, with qualifications, below.)  Note also that Aristotle treats propositions with an individual subject such as “Socrates is wise” as universal propositions (as if the proposition was saying something like “all instances of Socrates” are wise.)  One caveat:  Although we cannot linger on further complications here, keep in mind that this is not the only way to divide up logical possibility.

5. Square of Opposition

Aristotle examines the way in which these four different categorical propositions are related to one another.  His views have come down to us as “the square of opposition,” a mnemonic diagram that captures, systematizes, and slightly extends what Aristotle says in De Interpretatione. (Cf. 6.17a25ff.)

Figure 1

The Traditional Square of Opposition


As it turns out, we can use a square with crossed interior diagonals (Fig. 1 above) to identify four kinds of relationships that hold between different pairs of categorical propositions.  Consider each relationship in turn.

1)  Contradictory propositions possess opposite truth-values.  In the diagram, they are linked by a diagonal line.  If one of two contradictories is true, the other must be false, and vice versa.  So the A proposition (All S are P) and the O proposition (Some S are not P) are contradictories.  Clearly, if it is true that “all S are P,” then the O statement that “some S are not P” must be false.  And if it is true that “some S are not P,” then the A statement that “all S are P” must be false.  The same relationship holds between E (No S are P) and I (Some S are P) propositions.  To use a simple example: If it is true that “all birds lay eggs,” then it must be false that “some birds do not lay eggs.”  And if it is true that “some birds do not fly,” then it must be false that “all birds fly.”

2)  Contrary propositions cannot both be true.  The top horizontal line in the square joining the A proposition (All S are P) to the E proposition (No S are P) represents this logical relationship.  Clearly, it cannot be true that “all S are P” and that “no S are P.”  The truth of one of these contrary propositions excludes the truth of the other.  It is possible, however, that both statements are false as in the case where some S are P and some (other) S are not P.  So, for example, the statements “all politicians tell lies” and “no politicians tell lies” cannot both be true.  They will, however, both be false if it is indeed the case that some politicians tell lies whereas some do not.

3)  The relationship of subalternation results when the truth of a universal proposition, “the superaltern,” requires the truth of a second particular proposition, “the subaltern.”  The vertical lines moving downward from the top to the bottom of the square in the diagram represent this condition.  Clearly, if all members of an existent group possess (or do not possess) a specific characteristic, it must follow that any smaller subset of that group must possess (or not possess) that specific characteristic.  If the A proposition (All S are P) is true, it must follow that the I proposition (“Some S are P”) must be true.  Again, if the E proposition (No S are P) is true, it must follow that the O proposition (Some S are not P) must be true.  Consider, for example, the statement, “all cheetahs are fast.”  If every member of the whole group of cheetahs is fast, then it must be the case that at least one member of the group of cheetahs is fast; that is, the statement “some cheetahs are fast” must be true.  And, to reformulate the same example as a negation, if it is true that “no cheetahs are slow,” then it must be the case that at least one member of the group of cheetahs is not slow; that is, the statement “some cheetahs are not slow” must be true.

Note that subalternation does not work in the opposite direction.  If “Some S are P,” it need not follow that “All S are P.”  And if “Some S are not P,” it need not follow that “No S are P.”  We should also point out that if the subaltern is false, it must follow that the superaltern is false.  If it is false to say that “Some S are P,” it must be false to say that “All S are P.”  And if it is false to say that “Some S are not P,” it must be false to say that “No S are P.”

4)  Subcontrary propositions cannot both be false.  The bottom horizontal line in the square joining the I proposition (Some S are P) to the O proposition (Some S are not P) represents this kind of subcontrary relationship.  Keeping to the assumptions implicit in Aristotle’s system, there are only three possibilities: (1) All S have property P; in which case, it must also be true (by subalternation) that “some S are P.”  (2) No S have property P; in which case it must also be true (by subalternation) that “some S are not P.”  (3)  Some S have and some S do not have property P; in which case it will be true that “some S are P” and that “some S are not P.”  It follows that at least one of a pair of subcontrary propositions must be true and that both will be true in cases where P is partially predicated of S.  So, for example, both members of the subcontrary pair “some men have beards” and “some men do not have beards” are true.  They are both true because having a beard is a contingent or variable male attribute.  In contrast, only one member of the subcontrary pair “some snakes are legless” and “some snakes are not legless” is true.  As all snakes are legless, the proposition “some snakes are not legless” must be false.

Traditional logicians, inspired by Aristotle’s wide-ranging comments, identified a series of “immediate inferences” as a way of deriving new propositions through a routine rearrangement of terms.  Subalternation is an obvious example of immediate inference.  From “All S are P” we can immediately infer—that is, without argument—that “some S are P.”  They also recognized conversion, obversion, and contraposition as immediate inferences.

In conversion, one interchanges the S and P terms.  If, for example, we know that “No S is P,” we can immediately infer that “No P is S.”  (Once we know that “no circles are triangles,” we know right away that “no triangles are circles.”)

In obversion, one negates the predicate term while replacing it with the predicate term of opposite quality.  If, for example, we know that “Some S are P,” we can immediately infer the obverse, “Some S are not non-P.”  (Once we know that “some students are happy,” we know right away that “some students are not unhappy.”)

Finally, in contraposition, one negates both terms and reverses their order.  If, for example, we know that “All S are P,” we can infer the contrapositive “All non-P are non-S.”  (Once we know that “all voters are adults,” we know right away that “all children are unable to vote.”)  More specific rules, restrictions, and details are readily available elsewhere.

6. Laws of Thought

During the 18th, 19th, and early 20th Century, scholars who saw themselves as carrying on the Aristotelian and Medieval tradition in logic, often pointed to the “laws of thought” as the basis of all logic.  One still encounters this approach in textbook accounts of informal logic.  The usual list of logical laws (or logical first principles) includes three axioms: the law of identity, the law of non-contradiction, and the law of excluded middle.  (Some authors include a law of sufficient reason, that every event or claim must have a sufficient reason or explanation, and so forth.)  It would be a gross simplification to argue that these ideas derive exclusively from Aristotle or to suggest (as some authors seem to imply) that he self-consciously presented a theory uniquely derived from these three laws.  The idea is rather that Aristotle’s theory presupposes these principles and/or that he discusses or alludes to them somewhere in his work.  Traditional logicians did not regard them as abstruse or esoteric doctrines but as manifestly obvious principles that require assent for logical discourse to be possible.

The law of identity could be summarized as the patently unremarkable but seemingly inescapable notion that things must be, of course, identical with themselves.  Expressed symbolically: “A is A,” where A is an individual, a species, or a genus.  Although Aristotle never explicitly enunciates this law, he does observe, in the Metaphysics, that “the fact that a thing is itself is [the only] answer to all such questions as why the man is man, or the musician musical.” (VII.17.1041a16-18, Ross.)  This suggests that he does accept, unsurprisingly, the perfectly obvious idea that things are themselves.  If, however, identical things must possess identical attributes, this opens the door to various logical maneuvers.  One can, for example, substitute equivalent terms for one another and, even more portentously, one can arrive at some conception of analogy and induction.  Aristotle writes, “all water is said to be . . .  the same as all water  . . .  because of a certain likeness.” (Topics, I.7.103a19-20, Pickard-Cambridge.)  If water is water, then by the law of identity, anything we discover to be water must possess the same water-properties.

Aristotle provides several formulations of the law of non-contradiction, the idea that logically correct propositions cannot affirm and deny the same thing:

“It is impossible for anyone to believe the same thing to be and not be.” (Metaphysics, IV.3.1005b23-24, Ross.)

“The same attribute cannot at the same time belong and not belong to the same subject in the same respect.” (Ibid., IV.3.1005b19-20.)

“The most indisputable of all beliefs is that contradictory statements are not at the same time true.” (Ibid., IV.6.1011b13-14.)

Symbolically, the law of non-contradiction is sometimes represented as “not (A and not A).”

The law of excluded middle can be summarized as the idea that every proposition must be either true or false, not both and not neither.  In Aristotle’s words, “It is necessary for the affirmation or the negation to be true or false.”  (De Interpretatione, 9.18a28-29, Ackrill.)  Symbolically, we can represent the law of excluded middle as an exclusive disjunction: “A is true or A is false,” where only one alternative holds.  Because every proposition must be true or false, it does not follow, of course, that we can know if a particular proposition is true or false.

Despite perennial challenges to these so-called laws (by intuitionists, dialetheists, and others), Aristotelians inevitably claim that such counterarguments hinge on some unresolved ambiguity (equivocation), on a conflation of what we know with what is actually the case, on a false or static account of identity, or on some other failure to fully grasp the implications of what one is saying.

7. Existential Assumptions

Before we move on to consider Aristotle’s account of the syllogism, we need to clear up some widespread misconceptions and explain a few things about Aristotle’s project as a whole.  Criticisms of Aristotle’s logic often assume that what Aristotle was trying to do coincides with the basic project of modern logic.  Begin with the usual criticism brought against the traditional square of opposition.  For reasons we will not explore, modern logicians assume that universal claims about non-existent objects (or empty sets) are true but that particular claims about them are false.  On this reading, the claim that “all fairy-god mothers are beautiful” is true, whereas the claim that “some fairy-god mothers are beautiful” is false.  Clearly, this clashes with the traditional square of opposition.  By simple subalternation, the truth of the proposition “all fairy-god mothers are beautiful” requires the truth of the proposition “some fairy-god mothers are beautiful.”  If the first claim is true, the second claim must also be true.  For this and similar reasons, some modern logicians dismiss the traditional square as inadequate, claiming that Aristotle made a mistake or overlooked relevant issues.  Aristotle, however, is involved in a specialized project.  He elaborates an alternative logic, specifically adapted to the problems he is trying to solve.

Aristotle devises a companion-logic for science.  He relegates fictions like fairy godmothers and mermaids and unicorns to the realms of poetry and literature.  In his mind, they exist outside the ambit of science.  This is why he leaves no room for such non-existent entities in his logic.  This is a thoughtful choice, not an inadvertent omission.  Technically, Aristotelian science is a search for definitions, where a definition is “a phrase signifying a thing’s essence.” (Topics, I.5.102a37, Pickard-Cambridge.)  To possess an essence—is literally to possess a “what-it-is-to-be” something (to ti ēn einai).  Because non-existent entities cannot be anything, they do not, in Aristotle’s mind, possess an essence.  They cannot be defined.  Aristotle makes this point explicitly in the Posterior Analytics.  He points out that a definition of a goat-stag, a cross between a goat and a deer (the ancient equivalent of a unicorn), is impossible.  He writes, “no one knows the nature of what does not exist—[we] can know the meaning of the phrase or name ‘goat-stag’ but not what the essential nature of a goat-stag is.” (II.7.92b6-8, Mure.)  Because we cannot know what the essential nature of a goat-stag is—indeed, it has no essential nature—we cannot provide a proper definition of a goat-stag.  So the study of goat-stags (or unicorns) is not open to scientific investigation.  Aristotle sets about designing a logic that is intended to display relations between scientific propositions, where science is understood as a search for essential definitions.  This is why he leaves no place for fictional entities like goat-stags (or unicorns).  Hence, the assumed validity of a logical maneuver like subalternation.

8. Form versus Content

However, this is not the only way Aristotle’s approach parts ways with more modern assumptions.  Some modern logicians might define logic as that philosophical inquiry which considers the form not the content of propositions.  Aristotle’s logic is unapologetically metaphysical.  We cannot properly understand what Aristotle is about by separating form from content.  Suppose, for example, I was to claim that (1) all birds have feathers and (2) that everyone in the Tremblay family wears a red hat.  These two claims possess the same very same propositional form, A.  We can represent the first claim as: “All S are P,” where S=birds, and P=being feathered.  And we can also represent the second claim as “All S are P,” where S=members of the Tremblay family, and P=wearing a red hat.  Considered from an Aristotelian point of view, however, these two “All S are P” propositions possess a very different logical status.  Aristotle would view the relationship between birds and feathers expressed in the first proposition as a necessary link, for it is of the essence of birds to be feathered.  Something cannot be a bird and lack feathers.  The link between membership in the Tremblay family and the practice of wearing a red hat described in the second proposition is, in sharp contrast, a contingent fact about the world.  A member of the Tremblay family who wore a green hat would still be a member of the Tremblay family.  The fact that the Tremblays only wear red hats (because it is presently the fashion in Quebec) is an accidental (or surface) feature of what a Tremblay is.  So this second relationship holds in a much weaker sense.  In Aristotle’s mind, this has important consequences not just for metaphysics, but for logic.

It is hard to capture in modern English the underlying metaphysical force in Aristotle’s categorical statements.  In the Prior Analytics Aristotle renders the phrase “S is P” as “P belongs to S.”  The sense of belonging here is crucial.  Aristotle wants a logic that tells us what belongs to what.  But there are different levels of belonging.  My billfold belongs to me but this is a very tenuous sort of belonging.  The way my billfold belongs to me pales in significance to, say, the way a bill belongs to a duck-billed platypus.  It is not simply that the bill is physically attached to the platypus.  Even if you were to cut off the bill of a platypus, this would just create a deformed platypus; it would not change the sense of necessary belonging that connects platypuses and bills.  The deep nature of a platypus requires—it necessitates—a bill.  In so much as logic is about discovering necessary relationships, it is not the mere arrangement of terms and symbols but their substantive meaning that is at issue.

As only one consequence of this “metaphysical attitude,” consider Aristotle’s attitude towards inductive generalizations. Aristotle would have no patience for the modern penchant for purely statistical interpretations of inductive generalizations.  It is not the number of times something happens that matters.  It is the deep nature of the thing that counts.  If the wicked boy (or girl) next door pulls three legs off a spider, this is just happenstance.  This five-legged spider does not (for Aristotle) present a serious counterexample to the claim that “all spiders are eight-legged.”  The fact that someone can pull legs off a spider does not change the fact that there is a necessary connection between spiders and having eight legs.  Aristotle is too keen a biologist not to recognize that there are accidents and monstrosities in the world, but the existence of these individual imperfections does not change the deep nature of things.  Aristotle recognizes then that some types of belonging are more substantial—that is, more real—than others.  But this has repercussions for the ways in which we evaluate arguments.  In Aristotle’s mind, the strength of the logical connection that ties a conclusion to the premises in an argument depends, decisively, on the metaphysical status of the claims we are making.  Another example may help.  Suppose I were to argue, first:  “Ostriches are birds; all birds have feathers, therefore, ostriches have feathers.”  Then, second, “Hélène is the youngest daughter of the Tremblay family; all members of the Tremblay family wear red hats; therefore, Hélène wears a red hat.”  These arguments possess the same form.  (We will worry about formal details later.)  But, to Aristotle’s way of thinking, the first argument is, logically, more rigorous than the second.  Its conclusion follows from the essential and therefore necessary features of birds.  In the second argument, the conclusion only follows from the contingent state of fashion in Quebec.  In Aristotelian logic, the strength of an argument depends, in some important way, on metaphysical issues.  We can’t simply say “All S are P; and so forth” and be done with it.  We have to know what “S” and “P” stand for.  This is very different than modern symbolic logic.  Although Aristotle does use letters to take the place of variable terms in a logical relation, we should not be misled into thinking that the substantive content of what is being discussed does not matter.

9. The Syllogism

We are now in a position to consider Aristotle’s theory of the syllogism.  Although one senses that Aristotle took great pride in these accomplishments, we could complain that the persistent focus on the mechanics of the valid syllogism has obscured his larger project.  We will only cover the most basic points here, largely ignoring hypothetical syllogisms, modal syllogisms, extended syllogisms (sorites), inter alia.  The syllogistic now taught in undergraduate philosophy departments represents a later development of Aristotle’s ideas, after they were reworked at the hands of Medieval and modern logicians.  We will begin with a brief account of the way syllogisms are presented in modern logic and then move on to discussion of Aristotle’s somewhat different account.

We can define a syllogism, in relation to its logical form, as an argument made up of three categorical propositions, two premises (which set out the evidence), and a conclusion (that follows logically from the premises).  In the standard account, the propositions are composed of three terms, a subject term, a predicate term, and a middle term: the subject term is the (grammatical) subject of the conclusion; the predicate term modifies the subject in the conclusion, and the middle term links the subject and predicate terms in the premises.  The subject and predicate terms appear in different premises; the middle term appears once in each premise.  The premise with the predicate term and the middle term is called the major premise; the premise with the subject term and the middle term is called the minor premise.  Because syllogisms depend on the precise arrangement of terms, syllogistic logic is sometimes referred to as term logic.  Most readers of this piece are already familiar with some version of a proverbial (non-Aristotelian) example: “All men are mortal; (all) Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle are men; therefore, Socrates, Plato and Aristotle are mortal.”  If we symbolize the three terms in this syllogism such that Middle Term, M=man; Subject Term, S=Socrates, Plato, Aristotle; Predicate Term, P=mortal; we can represent the argument as: Major Premise:  All M is P;  Minor Premise:  All S is M;  Conclusion:  So, All S is P.  In the Middle Ages, scholars came up with Latin names for valid syllogisms, using vowels to represent the position of each categorical proposition.  (Their list is readily available elsewhere.)  The precise arrangement of propositions in this syllogism goes by the Latin moniker “Barbara” because the syllogism is composed of three A propositions: hence, BArbArA: AAA.  A syllogism in Barbara is clearly valid where validity can be understood (in modern terms) as the requirement that if the premises of the argument are true, then the conclusion must be true.  Modern textbook authors generally prove the validity of syllogisms in two ways.  First, they use a number of different rules.  For example: “when major and minor terms are universal in the conclusion they must be universal in the premises”; “if one premise is negative, the conclusion must be negative”; “the middle term in the premises must be distributed (include every member of a class) at least once,” and so on.  Second, they use Venn diagrams, intersecting circles marked to indicate the extension (or range) of different terms, to determine if the information contained in the conclusion is also included in the premises.

Modern logicians, who still hold to traditional conventions, classify syllogisms according to figure and mood.  The four figure classification derives from Aristotle; the mood classification, from Medieval logicians.  One determines the figure of a syllogism by recording the positions the middle term takes in the two premises.  So, for Barbara above, the figure is MP-SM, generally referred to as Figure 1.  One determines the mood of a syllogism by recording the precise arrangement of categorical propositions.  So, for Barbara, the mood is AAA.  By tabulating figures and moods, we can make an inventory of valid syllogisms.  (Medieval philosophers devised a mnemonic poem for such purposes that begins with the line “Barbara, Celarent, Darii, Ferioque priorisis.”  Details can be found in many textbooks.)  Although traditional classroom treatments prefer to stick to this time-honoured approach, Fred Sommers and George Englebretsen have devised a more up-to-date term logic that uses equations with “+” and “−” operators and is more attuned to natural language reasoning than the usual predicate logic.  Turn then to a brief discussion of Aristotle’s own account of the syllogism.

As already mentioned, we need to distinguish between two kinds of necessity.  Aristotle believes in metaphysical or natural necessity.  Birds must have feathers because that is their nature.  So the proposition “All birds have feathers” is necessarily true.”  But Aristotle identifies the syllogistic form with the logical necessity that obtains when two separate propositions necessitate a third.  He defines a sullogismos as “a discourse [logos] in which, certain things being stated, something other than what is stated follows of necessity from them.” (Prior Analytics, I.1.24b18-20, Jenkinson.)  The emphasis here is on the sense of inevitable consequence that precipitates a conclusion when certain forms of propositions are added together.  Indeed, the original Greek term for syllogism is more rigorously translated as “deduction.”  In the Prior Analytics, Aristotle’s method is exploratory.  He searches for pairs of propositions that combine to produce a necessary conclusion.  He begins by accepting that a few syllogisms are self-evidently (or transparently) true.  Barbara, AAA-Fig.1, discussed above, is the best example of this kind of “perfect syllogism.”  Another example of a perfect syllogism is Celarent: EAE-Fig.1.  On seeing the arrangement of terms in such cases, one immediately understands that the conclusion follows necessarily from the premises.  In the case of imperfect syllogisms Aristotle relies on a method of proof that translates them, step-by-step, into perfect syllogisms through a careful rearrangement of terms.  He does this directly, through conversion, or indirectly, through the relationships of contradiction and contrariety outlined in the square of opposition.  To cite only one very simple example, consider a brief passage in the Prior Analytics (I.5.27a5ff) where Aristotle demonstrates that the propositions “No P are M,” and “All S are M” can be combined to produce a syllogism with the conclusion, “No S are P.”  If “No P are M,” it must follow that “No M are P” (conversion); but “No M are P” combined with the second premise, “All S are M” proves that “No S are P.”  (This is to reduce the imperfect syllogism Cesare to the perfect syllogism Celarent.)  This conversion of an imperfect syllogism into a perfect syllogism demonstrates that the original arrangement of terms is a genuine deduction.  In other cases, Aristotle proves that particular arrangements of terms cannot yield proper syllogisms by showing that, in these instances, true premises lead to obviously false or contradictory conclusions.  Alongside these proofs of logical necessity, Aristotle derives general rules for syllogisms, classifies them according to figure, and so on.

It is important to reiterate that Aristotelian syllogisms are not (primarily) about hypothetical sets, imaginary classes, or purely abstract mathematical entities.  Aristotle believes there are natural groups in the world—species and genera—made up of individual members that share a similar nature, and hence similar properties.   It is this sharing of individual things in a similar nature that makes universal statements possible.  Once we have universal terms, we can make over-arching statements that, when combined, lead inescapably to specific results.  In the most rigorous syllogistic, metaphysical necessity is added to logical necessity to produce an unassailable inference.  Seen in this Aristotelian light, syllogisms can be construed as a vehicle for identifying the deep, immutable natures that make things what they are.

Medieval logicians summarized their understanding of the rationale underlying the syllogism in the so-called dictum de omni et nullo (the maxim of all and none), the principle that whatever is affirmed or denied of a whole must be affirmed or denied of a part (which they alleged derived from a reading of Prior Analytics I.1.24b27-30).  Some contemporary authors have claimed that Aristotelian syllogistic is at least compatible with a deflationary theory of truth, the modern idea that truth-claims about propositions amount to little more than an assertion of the statement itself.  (To say that “S is P” is true, is just to assert “S is P.”)  Perhaps it would be better to say that one can trace the modern preoccupation with validity in formal logic to the distinction between issues of logical necessity and propositional truth implicit in Aristotle.  In Aristotle’s logic, arguments do not take the form: “this state of affairs is true/false,” “this state of affairs is true/false,” therefore this state of affairs is true/false.”  We do not argue “All S is M is true” but merely, “All S is M.”  When it comes to determining validity—that is, when it comes to determining whether we have discovered a true syllogism—the question of the truth or falsity of propositions is pushed aside and attention is focused on an evaluation of the logical connection between premises and conclusion.  Obviously, Aristotle recognizes that ascertaining the material truth of premises is an important part of argument evaluation, but he does not present a “truth-functional” logic.  The concept of a “truth value” does not play any explicit role in his formal analysis the way it does, for example, with modern truth tables.  Mostly, Aristotle wants to know what we can confidently conclude from two presumably true premises; that is, what kind of knowledge can be produced or demonstrated if two given premises are true.

10. Inductive Syllogism

Understanding what Aristotle means by inductive syllogism is a matter of serious scholarly dispute.  Although there is only abbreviated textual evidence to go by, his  account of inductive argument can be supplemented by his ampler account of its rhetorical analogues, argument from analogy and argument from example.  What is clear is that Aristotle thinks of induction (epagoge) as a form of reasoning that begins in the sense perception of particulars and ends in a understanding that can be expressed in a universal proposition (or even a concept).  We pick up mental momentum through a familiarity with particular cases that allows us to arrive at a general understanding of an entire species or genus.  As we discuss below, there are indications that Aristotle views induction, in the first instance, as a manifestation of immediate understanding and not as an argument form.  Nonetheless, in the Prior Analytics II.23 (and 24), he casts inductive reasoning in syllogistic form, illustrating the “syllogism that springs out of induction” (ho ex epagoges sullogismos) by an argument about the longevity of bileless animals.

Relying on old biological ideas, Aristotle argues that we can move from observations about the longevity of individual species of bileless animals (that is, animals with clean-blood) to the universal conclusion that bilelessness is a cause of longevity.  His argument can be paraphrased in modern English: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  Although this argument seems, by modern standards, invalid, Aristotle apparently claims that it is a valid deduction.  (Remember that the word “syllogism” means “deduction,” so an “inductive syllogism” is, literally, an “inductive deduction.”)  He uses a technical notion of “convertibility” to formally secure the validity of the argument.  According to this logical rule, terms that cover the same range of cases (because they refer to the same nature) are interchangeable (antistrepho).  They can be substituted for one another.  Aristotle believes that because the logical terms “men, horses, mules, etc” and “bileless animals” refer to the same genus, they are convertible.  If, however, we invert the terms in the proposition “all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals” to “all bileless animals are men, horses, mules, and so forth,” we can then rephrase the original argument: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all bileless animals are men, horses, mules, and so forth; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  This revised induction possesses an obviously valid form (Barbara, discussed above).  Note that Aristotle does not view this inversion of terms as a formal gimmick or trick; he believes that it reflects something metaphysically true about shared natures in the world.  (One could argue that inductive syllogism operates by means of the quantification of the predicate term as well as the subject term of a categorical proposition, but we will not investigate that issue here.)

These passages pose multiple problems of interpretation.  We can only advance a general overview of the most important disagreements here.  We might identify four different interpretations of Aristotle’s account of the inductive syllogism.  (1)  The fact that Aristotle seems to view this as a valid syllogism has led many commentators (such as Ross, McKirahan, Peters) to assume that he is referring to what is known as “perfect induction,” a generalization that is built up from a complete enumeration of particular cases.  The main problem here is that it seems to involve a physical impossibility.  No one could empirically inspect every bileless animal (and/or species) to ascertain that the connection between bilelessness and longevity obtains in every case.  (2) Some commentators combine this first explanation with the further suggestion that the bileless example is a rare case and that Aristotle believes, in line with modern accounts, that most inductions only produce probable belief.  (Cf. Govier’s claim that there is a “tradition going back to Aristotle, which maintains that there are  . . .  only two broad types of argument: deductive arguments which are conclusive, and inductive arguments, which are not.”  (Problems in Argument Analysis, 52.))  One problem with such claims is that they overlook the clear distinction that Aristotle makes between rigorous inductions and rhetorical inductions (which we discuss below).  (3)  Some commentators claim that Aristotle (and the ancients generally) overlooked the inherent tenuousness of the inductive reasoning.  On this account, Empiricists such as Locke and Hume discovered something seriously wrong about induction that escaped the notice of an ancient author like Aristotle.  Philosophers in the modern Anglo-American tradition largely favor this interpretation.  (Cf. Garrett’s and Barbanell’s insistence that “Hume was the first to raise skeptical doubts about inductive reasoning, leaving a puzzle as to why the concerns he highlighted had earlier been so completely overlooked.”  (“Induction,” 172.)  Such allegations do not depend, however, on any close reading of a wealth of relevant passages in the Aristotelian corpus and in ancient philosophy generally.  (4) Finally, a minority contemporary view, growing in prominence, has argued that Aristotle did not conceive of induction as an enumerative process but as a matter of intelligent insight into natures.  (Cf. McCaskey, Biondi, Rijk , Groarke.)  On this account, Aristotle does not mean to suggest that inductive syllogism depends on an empirical inspection of every member of a group but on a universal act of understanding that operates through sense perception.  Aristotelian induction can best be compared to modern notions of abduction or inference to the best explanation.  This non-mathematical account has historical precedents in neo-Platonism, Thomism, Idealism, and in the textbook literature of traditionalist modern logicians that opposed the new formal logic.  This view has been criticized, however, as a form of mere intuitionism dependent on an antiquated metaphysics.

The basic idea that induction is valid will raise eyebrows, no doubt.  It is important to stave off some inevitable criticism before continuing.  Modern accounts of induction, deriving, in large part, from Hume and Locke, display a mania for prediction.  (Hence Hume’s question: how can we know that the future bread we eat will nourish us based on past experience of eating bread?)  But this is not primarily how Aristotle views the problem.  For Aristotle, induction is about understanding natural kinds.  Once we comprehend the nature of something, we will, of course, be able to make predictions about its future properties, but understanding its nature is the key.  In Aristotle’s mind, rigorous induction is valid because it picks out those necessary and essential traits that make something what it is.  To use a very simple example, understanding that all spiders have eight legs—that is, that all undamaged spiders have eight legs—is a matter of knowing something deep about the biological nature that constitutes a spider.  Something that does not have eight legs is not a spider.  (Fruitful analogies might be drawn here to the notion of “a posteriori necessity” countenanced by contemporary logicians such as Hilary Putnam and Saul Kripke or to the “revised” concept of a “natural kind” advanced by authors such as Hilary Kornblith or Brian Ellis.)

It is commonly said that Aristotle sees syllogisms as a device for explaining relationships between groups.  This is, in the main, true.  Still, there has to be some room for a consideration of individuals in logic if we hope to include induction as an essential aspect of reasoning.  As Aristotle explains, induction begins in sense perception and sense perception only has individuals as its object.  Some commentators would limit inductive syllogism to a movement from smaller groups (what Aristotle calls “primitive universals”) to larger groups, but one can only induce a generalization about a smaller group on the basis of a prior observation of individuals that compose that group.  A close reading reveals that Aristotle himself mentions syllogisms dealing with individuals (about the moon, Topics, 78b4ff; about the wall, 78b13ff; about the eclipse, Posterior Analytics, 93a29ff, and so on.)  If we treat individuals as universal terms or as representative of universal classes, this poses no problem for formal analysis.  Collecting observations about one individual or about individuals who belong to a larger group can lead to an accurate generalization.

11. Deduction versus Induction

We cannot fully understand the nature or role of inductive syllogism in Aristotle without situating it with respect to ordinary, “deductive” syllogism.  Aristotle’s distinction between deductive and inductive argument is not precisely equivalent to the modern distinction.  Contemporary authors differentiate between deduction and induction in terms of validity.  (A small group of informal logicians called “Deductivists” dispute this account.)  According a well-worn formula, deductive arguments are valid; inductive arguments are invalid.  The premises in a deductive argument guarantee the truth of the conclusion: if the premises are true, the conclusion must be true.  The premises in an inductive argument provide some degree of support for the conclusion, but it is possible to have true premises and a false conclusion.  Although some commentators attribute such views to Aristotle, this distinction between strict logical necessity and merely probable or plausible reasoning more easily maps onto the distinction Aristotle makes between scientific and rhetorical reasoning (both of which we discuss below).  Aristotle views inductive syllogism as scientific (as opposed to rhetorical) induction and therefore as a more rigorous form of inductive argument.

We can best understand what this amounts to by a careful comparison of a deductive and an inductive syllogism on the same topic.  If we reconstruct, along Aristotelian lines, a deduction on the longevity of bileless animals, the argument would presumably run: All bileless animals are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived.  Defining the terms in this syllogism as: Subject Term, S=men, horses, mules, and so forth; Predicate Term, P=long-lived animals; Middle Term, M=bileless animals, we can represent this metaphysically correct inference as:  Major Premise: All M are P.  Minor Premise: All S are M.  Conclusion: Therefore all S are P.  (Barbara.)  As we already have seen, the corresponding induction runs: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  Using the same definition of terms, we are left with:  Major Premise: All S are P.  Minor Premise: All S are M (convertible to All M are S).  Conclusion: Therefore, all M are P.  (Converted to Barbara.)  The difference between these two inferences is the difference between deductive and inductive argument in Aristotle.

Clearly, Aristotelian and modern treatments of these issues diverge.  As we have already indicated, in the modern formalism, one automatically defines subject, predicate, and middle terms of a syllogism according to their placement in the argument.  For Aristotle, the terms in a rigorous syllogism have a metaphysical significance as well.  In our correctly formulated deductive-inductive pair, S represents individual species and/or the individuals that make up those species (men, horses, mules, and so forth); M represents the deep nature of these things (bilelessness), and P represents the property that necessarily attaches to that nature (longevity).  Here then is the fundamental difference between Aristotelian deduction and induction in a nutshell.  In deduction, we prove that a property (P) belongs to individual species (S) because it possesses a certain nature (M); in induction, we prove that a property (P) belongs to a nature (M) because it belongs to individual species (S).  Expressed formally, deduction proves that the subject term (S) is associated with a predicate term (P) by means of the middle term (M); induction proves that the middle term (M) is associated with the predicate term (P) by means of the subject term (S).  (Cf. Prior Analytics, II.23.68b31-35.)  Aristotle does not claim that inductive syllogism is invalid but that the terms in an induction have been rearranged.  In deduction, the middle term joins the two extremes (the subject and predicate terms); in induction, one extreme, the subject term, acts as the middle term, joining the true middle term with the other extreme.  This is what Aristotle means when he maintains that in induction one uses a subject term to argue to a middle term.  Formally, with respect to the arrangement of terms, the subject term becomes the “middle term” in the argument.

Aristotle distinguishes then between induction and deduction in three different ways.  First, induction moves from particulars to a universal, whereas deduction moves from a universal to particulars.  The bileless induction moves from particular species to a universal nature; the bileless deduction moves from a universal nature to particular species.  Second, induction moves from observation to language (that is, from sense perception to propositions), whereas deduction moves from language to language (from propositions to a new proposition).  The bileless induction is really a way of demonstrating how observations of bileless animals lead to (propositional) knowledge about longevity; the bileless deduction demonstrates how (propositional) knowledge of a universal nature leads (propositional) knowledge about particular species. Third, induction identifies or explains a nature, whereas deduction applies or demonstrates a nature.  The bileless induction provides an explanation of the nature of particular species: it is of the nature of bileless organisms to possess a long life.  The bileless deduction applies that finding to particular species; once we know that it is of the nature of bileless organisms to possess a long life, we can demonstrate or put on display the property of longevity as it pertains to particular species.

One final point needs clarification.  The logical form of the inductive syllogism, after the convertibility maneuver, is the same as the deductive syllogism.  In this sense, induction and deduction possess the same (final) logical form.  But, of course, in order to successfully perform an induction, one has to know that convertibility is possible, and this requires an act of intelligence which is able to discern the metaphysical realities between things out in the world.  We discuss this issue under non-discursive reasoning below.

12. Science

Aristotle wants to construct a logic that provides a working language for rigorous science as he understands it.  Whereas we have been talking of syllogisms as arguments, Aristotelian science is about explanation.  Admittedly, informal logicians generally distinguish between explanation and argument.  An argument is intended to persuade about a debatable point; an explanation is not intended to persuade so much as to promote understanding.  Aristotle views science as involving logical inferences that move beyond what is disputable to a consideration of what is the case.  Still, the “explanatory” syllogisms used in science possess precisely the same formal structures as “argumentative” syllogisms.  So we might consider them arguments in a wider sense.  For his part, Aristotle relegates eristic reason to the broad field of rhetoric.  He views science, perhaps naively, as a domain of established fact.  The syllogisms used in science are about establishing an explanation from specific cases (induction) and then applying or illustrating this explanation to specific cases (deduction).

The ancient Greek term for science, “episteme,” is not precisely equivalent to its modern counterpart.  In Aristotle’s worldview, science, as the most rigorous sort of discursive knowledge, is opposed to mere opinion (doxa); it is about what is universal and necessary as opposed to what is particular and contingent, and it is theoretical as opposed to practical.  Aristotle believes that knowledge, understood as justified true belief, is most perfectly expressed in a scientific demonstration (apodeixis), also known as an apodeitic or scientific syllogism.  He posits a number of specific requirements for this most rigorous of all deductions.  In order to qualify as a scientific demonstration, a syllogism must possess premises that are “true, primary, immediate, better known than, prior to, and causative of the conclusion.” (Posterior Analytics, I.2.71b20ff, Tredennick.)  It must yield information about a natural kind or a group of individual things.  And it must produce universal knowledge (episteme).  Specialists have disputed the meaning of these individual requirements, but the main message is clear.  Aristotle accepts, as a general rule, that a conclusion in an argument cannot be more authoritative than the premises that led to that conclusion.  We cannot derive better (or more reliable) knowledge from worse (or less reliable) knowledge.  Given that a scientific demonstration is the most rigorous form of knowledge possible, we must start with premises that are utterly basic and as certain as possible, which are “immediately” induced from observation, and which confirm to the necessary structure of the world in a way that is authoritative and absolutely incontrovertible.  This requires a reliance on first principles which we discuss below.

In the best case scenario, Aristotelian science is about finding definitions of species that, according to a somewhat bald formula, identify the genus (the larger natural group) and the differentia (that unique feature that sets the species apart from the larger group).  As Aristotle’s focus on definitions is a bit cramped and less than consistent (he himself spends a great deal of time talking about necessary rather than essential properties), let us broaden his approach to science to focus on ostensible definitions, where an ostensible definition is either a rigorous definition or, more broadly, any properly-formulated phrase that identifies the unique properties of something.  On this looser approach, which is more consistent with Aristotle’s actual practice, to define an entity is to identify the nature, the essential and necessary properties, that make it uniquely what it is.  Suffice it to say that Aristotle’s idealized account of what science entails needs to be expanded to cover a wide range of activities and that fall under what is now known as scientific practice.  What follows is a general sketch of his overall orientation.  (We should point out that Aristotle himself resorts to whatever informal methods seem appropriate when reporting on his own biological investigations without too much concern for any fixed ideal of formal correctness.  He makes no attempt to cast his own scientific conclusions in metaphysically-correct syllogisms.  One could perhaps insist that he uses enthymemes (syllogisms with unstated premises), but mostly, he just seems to record what seems appropriate without any deliberate attempt at correct formalization.  Note that most of Aristotle’s scientific work is “historia,” an earlier stage of observing, fact-collecting, and opinion-reporting that proceeds the principled theorizing of advanced science.)

For Aristotle, even theology is a science insomuch as it deals with universal and necessary principles.  Still, in line with modern attitudes (and in opposition to Plato), Aristotle views sense-perception as the proper route to scientific knowledge.  Our empirical experience of the world yields knowledge through induction.  Aristotle elaborates then an inductive-deductive model of science.  Through careful observation of  particular species, the scientist induces an ostensible definition to explain a nature and then demonstrates the consequences of that nature for particular species.  Consider a specific case.  In the Posterior Analytics (II.16-17.98b32ff, 99a24ff), Aristotle mentions an explanation about why deciduous plants lose their leaves in the winter.  The ancients apparently believed this happens because sap coagulates at the base of the leaf (which is not entirely off the mark).  We can use this ancient example of a botanical explanation to illustrate how the business of Aristotelian science is supposed to operate.  Suppose we are a group of ancient botanists who discover, through empirical inspection, why deciduous plants such as vines and figs lose their leaves.  Following Aristotle’s lead, we can cast our discovery in the form of the following inductive syllogism:  “Vine, fig, and so forth, are deciduous.  Vine, fig, and so forth, coagulate sap.  Therefore, all sap-coagulators are deciduous.”  This induction produces the definition of “deciduous.”  (“Deciduous” is the definiendum; sap-coagulation, the definiens; the point being that everything that is a sap-coagulator is deciduous, which might not be the case if we turned it around and said “All deciduous plants are sap-coagulators.”)  But once we have a definition of “deciduous,” we can use it as the first premise in a deduction to demonstrate something about say, the genus “broad-leaved trees.”  We can apply, in other words, what we have learned about deciduous plants in general to the more specific genus of broad-leaved trees.  Our deduction will read:  “All sap-coagulators are deciduous.  All broad-leaved trees are sap-coagulators.  Therefore, all broad-leaved trees are deciduous.”  We can express all this symbolically.  For the induction, where S=vine, fig, and so forth, P=deciduous, M= being a sap-coagulator, the argument is: “All S is P; all S is M (convertible to all M is S); therefore, all M are P (converted to Barbara).  For the deduction, where S=broad-leafed trees, M=being a sap-coagulator, P=deciduous, the argument can be represented: “All M are P; all S is M; therefore, all S is P” (Barbara).  This is then the basic logic of Aristotelian science.

A simple diagram of how science operates follows (Figure 2).

Figure 2

The Inductive-Deductive Method of Aristotelian Science

Aristotle views science as a search for causes (aitia).  In a well-known example about planets not twinkling because they are close to the earth (Posterior Analytics, I.13), he makes an important distinction between knowledge of the fact and knowledge of the reasoned fact. The rigorous scientist aims at knowledge of the reasoned fact which explains why something is the way it is.  In our example, sap-coagulation is the cause of deciduous; deciduous is not the cause of sap-coagulation.  That is why “sap-coagulation” is featured here as the middle term, because it is the cause of the phenomenon being investigated.  The deduction “All sap-coagulators are deciduous; all broad-leaved trees are sap-coagulators; therefore, all broad-leaved trees are deciduous” counts as knowledge of the reasoned fact because it reveals the cause of broad-leafed deciduousness.

Aristotle makes a further distinction between what is more knowable relative to us and what is more knowable by nature (or in itself).  He remarks in the Physics, “The natural way of [inquiry] is to start from the things which are more knowable and obvious to us and proceed towards those which are clearer and more knowable by nature; for the same things are not ‘knowable relatively to us’ and ‘knowable’ without qualification.”  (I.184a15, Hardie, Gaye.)  In science we generally move from the effect to the cause, from what we see and observe around us to the hidden origins of things.  The outward manifestation of the phenomenon of “deciduousness” is more accessible to us because we can see the trees shedding their leaves, but sap-coagulation as an explanatory principle is more knowable in itself because it embodies the cause.  To know about sap-coagulation counts as an advance in knowledge; someone who knows this knows more than someone who only knows that trees shed their leaves in the fall.  Aristotle believes that the job of science is to put on display what best counts as knowledge, even if the resulting theory strays from our immediate perceptions and first concerns.

Jan Lukasiewicz, a modern-day pioneer in term logic, comments that “some queer philosophical prejudices which cannot be explained rationally” made early commentators claim that the major premise in a syllogism (the one with the middle and predicate terms) must be first.  (Aristotle’s Syllogistic, 32.)  But once we view the syllogism within the larger context of Aristotelian logic, it becomes perfectly obvious why these early commentators put the major premise first: because it constitutes the (ostensible) definition; because it contains an explanation of the nature of the thing upon which everything else depends.  The major premise in a scientific deduction is the most important part of the syllogism; it is scientifically prior in that it reveals the cause that motivates the phenomenon.  So it makes sense to place it first.  This was not an irrational prejudice.

13. Non-Discursive Reasoning

The distinction Aristotle draws between discursive knowledge (that is, knowledge through argument) and non-discursive knowledge (that is, knowledge through nous) is akin to the medieval distinction between ratio (argument) and intellectus (direct intellection).  In Aristotelian logic, non-discursive knowledge comes first and provides the starting points upon which discursive or argumentative knowledge depends.  It is hard to know what to call the mental power that gives rise to this type of knowledge in English.  The traditional term “intuition” invites misunderstanding.  When Aristotle claims that there is an immediate sort of knowledge that comes directly from the mind (nous) without discursive argument, he is not suggesting that knowledge can be accessed through vague feelings or hunches.  He is referring to a capacity for intelligent appraisal that might be better described as discernment, comprehension, or insight.  Like his later medieval followers, he views “intuition” as a species of reason; it is not prior to reason or outside of reason, it is—in the highest degree—the activity of reason itself.  (Cf. Posterior Analytics, II. 19; Nicomachean Ethics, IV.6.)

For Aristotle, science is only one manifestation of human intelligence.  He includes, for example, intuition, craft, philosophical wisdom, and moral decision-making along with science in his account of the five intellectual virtues.  (Nicomachean Ethics, VI.3-8.)  When it comes to knowledge-acquisition, however, intuition is primary.  It includes the most basic operations of intelligence, providing the ultimate ground of understanding and inference upon which everything else depends.  Aristotle is a firm empiricist.  He believes that knowledge begins in perception, but he also believes that we need intuition to make sense of perception.  In the Posterior Analytics (II.19.100a3-10), Aristotle posits a sequence of steps in mental development: sense perception produces memory which (in combination with intuition) produces human experience (empeiria), which produces art and science.  Through a widening movement of understanding (really, a non-discursive form of induction), intuition transforms observation and memory so as to produce knowledge (without argument).  This intuitive knowledge is even more reliable than science.  As Aristotle writes in key passages at the end of the Posterior Analytics, “no other kind of thought except intuition is more accurate than scientific knowledge,” and “nothing except intuition can be truer than scientific knowledge.” (100b8ff, Mure, slightly emended.)

Aristotelian intuition supplies the first principles (archai) of human knowledge: concepts, universal propositions, definitions, the laws of logic, the primary principles of the specialized science, and even moral concepts such as the various virtues.  This is why, according to Aristotle, intuition must be viewed as infallible.  We cannot claim that the first principles of human intelligence are dubious and then turn around and use those principles to make authoritative claims about the possibility (or impossibility) of knowledge.  If we begin to doubt intuition, that is, human intelligence at its most fundamental level of operation, we will have to doubt everything else that is built upon this universal foundation: science, philosophy, knowledge, logic, inference, and so forth.  Aristotle never tries to prove first principles.  He acknowledges that when it comes to the origins of human thought, there is a point when one must simply stop asking questions.  As he points out, any attempt at absolute proof would lead to an infinite regress.  In his own words: “It is impossible that there should be demonstration of absolutely everything; there would be an infinite regress, so that there would still be no demonstration.” (Metaphysics, 1006a6ff, Ross.)  Aristotle does make arguments, for example, that meaningful speech presupposes a logical axiom like the principle of non-contradiction, but that is not, strictly speaking, a proof of the principle.

Needless to say, Aristotle’s reliance on intuition has provoked a good deal of scholarly disagreement.  Contemporary commentators such as Joseph Owens, G. L. Owen, and Terrence Irwin have argued that Aristotelian first principles begin in dialectic.  On their influential account, we arrive at first principles through a weaker form of argument that revolves around a consideration of “endoxa,” the proverbial opinions of the many and/or the wise.  Robin Smith (and others) severely criticize their account.  The idea that mere opinion could somehow give rise to rigorous scientific knowledge conflicts with Aristotle’s settled view that less reliable knowledge cannot provide sufficient logical support for the more reliable knowledge.  As we discuss below, endoxa do provide a starting point for dialectical (and ethical) arguments in Aristotle’s system.  They are, in his mind, a potent intellectual resource, a library of stored wisdom and right opinion.  They may include potent expressions of first principles already discovered by other thinkers and previous generations.  But as Aristotle makes clear at the end of the Posterior Analytics and elsewhere, the recognition that something is a first principle depends directly on intuition.  As he reaffirms in the Nicomachean Ethics, “it is intuitive reason that grasps the first principles.”  (VI.6.1141a7, Ross.)

If Irwin and his colleagues seek to limit the role of intuition in Aristotle, authors such as Lambertus Marie de Rijk and D. W. Hamlyn go to an opposite extreme, denying the importance of the inductive syllogism and identifying induction (epagoge) exclusively with intuition.  De Rijk claims that Aristotelian induction is “a pre-argumentation procedure consisting in . . . [a] disclosure [that] does not take place by a formal, discursive inference, but is, as it were, jumped upon by an intuitive act of knowledge.” (Semantics and Ontology, I.2.53, 141-2.) Although this position seems extreme, it seems indisputable that inductive syllogism depends on intuition, for without intuition (understood as intelligent discernment), one could not recognize the convertibility of subject and middle terms (discussed above).  Aristotle also points out that one needs intuition to recognize the (ostensible) definitions so crucial to the practice of Aristotelian science.  We must be able to discern the difference between accidental and necessary or essential properties before coming up with a definition.  This can only come about through some kind of direct (non-discursive) discernment.  Aristotle proposes a method for discovering definitions called division—we are to divide things into smaller and smaller sub-groups—but this method depends wholly on nous.  (Cf. Posterior Analytics, II.13.)  Some modern Empiricist commentators, embarrassed by such mystical-sounding doctrines, warn that this emphasis on non-discursive reasoning collapses into pure rationalism (or Platonism), but this is a caricature.  What Aristotle means by rational “intuition” is not a matter of pure, disembodied thought.  One does not arrive at first principles by closing one’s eyes and retreating from the world (as with Cartesian introspection).  For Aristotle, first principles arise through a vigorous interaction of the empirical with the rational; a combination of rationality and sense experience produces the first seeds of human understanding.

Note that Aristotle believes that there are first principles (koinai archai) that are common to all fields of inquiry, such as the principle of non-contradiction or the law of excluded middle, and that each specialized science has its own first principles.  We may recover these first principles second-hand by a (dialectical) review of authorities.  Or, we can derive them first hand by analysis, by dividing the subject matter we are concerned with into its constituent parts.  At the beginning of the Physics, Aristotle explains, “What is to us plain and obvious at first is rather confused masses, the elements and principles of which become known to us later by analysis. Thus we must advance from generalities to particulars; for it is a whole that is best known to sense-perception, and a generality is a kind of whole, comprehending many things within it, like parts.  . . .  Similarly a child begins by calling all men ‘father,’ and all women ‘mother,’ but later on distinguishes each of them.”  (I.1.184a22-184b14, Hardie, Gaye.)  Just as children learn to distinguish their parents from other human beings, those who successfully study a science learn to distinguish the different natural kinds that make up the whole of a scientific phenomenon.  This precedes the work of induction and deduction already discussed. Once we have the parts (or the aspects), we can reason about them scientifically.

14. Rhetoric

Argumentation theorists (less aptly characterized as informal logicians) have critiqued the ascendancy of formal logic, complaining that the contemporary penchant for symbolic logic leaves one with an abstract mathematics of empty signs that cannot be applied in any useful way to larger issues.  Proponents of formal logic counter that their specialized formalism allows for a degree of precision otherwise not available and that any focus on the substantive meaning or truth of propositions is a distraction from logical issues per se.  We cannot readily fit Aristotle into one camp or the other.  Although he does provide a formal analysis of the syllogism, he intends logic primarily as a means of acquiring true statements about the world.  He also engages in an enthusiastic investigation of less rigorous forms of reasoning included in the study of dialectic and rhetoric.

Understanding precisely what Aristotle means by the term “dialectics” (dialektike) is no easy task.  He seems to view it as the technical study of argument in general or perhaps as a more specialized investigation into argumentative dialogue.  He intends his rhetoric (rhetorike), which he describes as the counterpart to dialectic, as an expansive study of the art of persuasion, particularly as it is directed towards a non-academic public.  Suffice it to say, for our purposes, that Aristotle reserves a place in his logic for a general examination of all arguments, for scientific reasoning, for rhetoric, for debating techniques of various sorts, for jurisprudential pleading, for cross-examination, for moral reasoning, for analysis, and for non-discursive intuition.

Aristotle distinguishes between what I will call, for convenience, rigorous logic and persuasive logic.  Rigorous logic aims at epistē, true belief about what is eternal, necessary, universal, and unchanging.  (Aristotle sometimes qualifies this to include “for the most part” scientific knowledge.)  Persuasive logic aims at acceptable, probable, or convincing belief (what we might call “opinion” instead of knowledge.)  It deals with approximate truth, with endoxa (popular or proverbial opinions), with reasoning that is acceptable to a particular audience, or with claims about accidental properties and contingent events.  Persuasive syllogisms have the same form as rigorous syllogisms but are understood as establishing their conclusions in a weaker manner.  As we have already seen, rigorous logic produces deductive and inductive syllogisms; Aristotle indicates that persuasive logic produces, in a parallel manner, enthymemes, analogies, and examples.  He defines an enthymeme as a deduction “concerned with things which may, generally speaking, be other than they are,” with matters that are “for the most part only generally true,”  or with “probabilities and signs”  (Rhetoric, I.2.1357a, Roberts).  He also mentions that the term “enthymeme” may refer to arguments with missing premises.  (Rhetoric, 1.2.1357a16-22.)  When it comes to induction, Aristotle’s presentation is more complicated, but we can reconstruct what he means in a more straightforward manner.

The persuasive counterpart to the inductive syllogism is the analogy and the example, but the example is really a composite argument formed from first, an analogy and second, an enthymeme.  Some initial confusion is to be expected as Aristotle’s understanding of analogies differs somewhat from contemporary accounts.  In contemporary treatments, analogies depend on a direct object(s)-to-object(s) comparison.  Aristotelian analogy, on the other hand, involves reasoning up to a general principle.  We are to conclude (1) that because individual things of a certain nature X have property z, everything that possesses nature X has property z.  But once we know that every X possesses property z, we can make a deduction (2) that some new example of nature X will also have property z.  Aristotle calls (1), the inductive movement up to the generalization, an analogy (literally, an argument from likeness=ton homoion); he calls (2), the deductive movement down to a new case, an enthymeme; and he considers (1) + (2), the combination of the analogy and the enthymeme together, an example (paradeigma).  He presents the following argument from example in the Rhetoric (I.2.1357b31-1358a1).  Suppose we wish to argue that Dionysus, the ruler, is asking for a bodyguard in order to set himself up as despot.  We can establish this by a two-step process.  First, we can draw a damning analogy between previous cases where rulers asked for a bodyguard and induce a general rule about such practices.  We can insist that Peisistratus, Theagenes, and other known tyrants, were scheming to make themselves despots, that Peisistratus, Theagenes, and other known tyrants also asked for a bodyguard, and that therefore, everyone who asks for a bodyguard is scheming to make themselves dictators.  But once we have established this general rule, we can move on to the second step in our argument, using this conclusion as a premise in an enthymeme.  We can argue that all people asking for a bodyguard are scheming to make themselves despots, that Dionysius is someone asking for a bodyguard, and that therefore, Dionysius must be scheming to make himself despot.  This is not, in Aristotle’s mind, rigorous reasoning.  Nonetheless, we can, in this way, induce probable conclusions and then use them to deduce probable consequences.  Although these arguments are intended to be persuasive or plausible rather than scientific, but the reasoning strategy mimics the inductive-deductive movement of science (without compelling, of course, the same degree of belief).

We should point out that Aristotle does not restrict himself to a consideration of purely formal issues in his discussion of rhetoric.  He famously distinguishes, for example, between three means of persuasion: ethos, pathos, and logos.  As we read, at the beginning of his Rhetoric: “Of the modes of persuasion furnished by the spoken word there are three kinds. . . . [Firstly,] persuasion is achieved by the speaker’s personal character when the speech is so spoken as to make us think him credible. . . . Secondly, persuasion may come through the hearers, when the speech stirs their emotions. . . . Thirdly, persuasion is effected through the speech itself when we have proved [the point] by means of the persuasive arguments suitable to the case in question.”  (Rhetoric, I.2.1356a2-21, Roberts.)  Aristotle concludes that effective arguers must (1) understand morality and be able to convince an audience that they themselves are good, trustworthy people worth listening to (ethos); (2) know the general causes of emotion and be able to elicit them from specific audience (pathos); and (3) be able to use logical techniques to make convincing (not necessarily sound) arguments (logos).  Aristotle broaches many other issues we cannot enter into here.  He acknowledges that the goal of rhetoric is persuasion, not truth.  Such techniques may be bent to immoral or dishonest ends.  Nonetheless, he insists that it is in the public interest to provide a comprehensive and systematic survey of the field.

We might mention two other logical devices that have a place in Aristotle’s work: the topos and the aporia.  Unfortunately, Aristotle never explicitly explains what a topos is.  The English word “topic” does not do justice to the original notion, for although Aristotelian topoi may be organized around subject matter, they focus more precisely on recommended strategies for successful arguing.  (The technical term derives from a Greek word referring to a physical location.  Some scholars suggest a link to ancient mnemonic techniques that superimposed lists on familiar physical locations as a memory aid.)  In relevant discussions (in the Topics and the Rhetoric) Aristotle offers helpful advice about finding (or remembering) suitable premises, about verbally out-manoeuvring an opponent, about finding forceful analogies, and so on.  Examples of specific topoi would include discussions about how to argue which is the better of two alternatives, how to substitute terms effectively, how to address issues about genus and property, how to argue about cause and effect, how to conceive of sameness and difference, and so on.  Some commentators suggest that different topoi may have been used in a classroom situation in conjunction with student exercises and standardized texts, or with written lists of endoxa, or even with ready-made arguments that students were expected to memorize.

An aporia is a common device in Greek philosophy.  The Greek word aporia (plural, aporiai) refers to a physical location blocked off by obstacles where there is no way out; by extension, it means, in philosophy, a mental perplexity, an impasse, a paradox or puzzle that stoutly resists solution.  Aristotle famously suggests that philosophers begin with aporiai and complete their task by resolving the apparent paradoxes.  An attentive reader will uncover many aporiai in Aristotle who begins many of his treatises with a diaporia, a survey of the puzzles that occupied previous thinkers.  Note that aporiai cannot be solved through some mechanical rearrangement of symbolic terms.  Solving puzzles requires intelligence and discernment; it requires some creative insight into what is at stake.

15. Fallacies

In a short work entitled Sophistical Refutations, Aristotle introduces a theory of logical fallacies that has been remarkably influential.  His treatment is abbreviated and somewhat obscure, and there is inevitably scholarly disagreement about precise exegesis.  Aristotle thinks of fallacies as instances of specious reasoning; they are not merely errors but hidden errors.  A fallacy is an incorrect reasoning strategy that gives the illusion of being sound or somehow conceals the underlying problem.  Aristotle divides fallacies into two broad categories: those which depend on language (sometimes called verbal fallacies) and those that are independent of language (sometimes called material fallacies).  There is some scholarly disagreement about particular fallacies, but traditional English names and familiar descriptions follow.  Linguistic fallacies include: homonymy (verbal equivocation), ambiguity (amphiboly or grammatical equivocation), composition (confusing parts with a whole), division (confusing a whole with parts), accent (equivocation that arises out of mispronunciation or misplaced emphasis) and figure of speech (ambiguity resulting from the form of an expression).  Independent fallacies include accident (overlooking exceptions), converse accident (hasty generalization or improper qualification), irrelevant conclusion, affirming the consequent (assuming an effect guarantees the presence of one possible cause), begging the question (assuming the point), false cause, and complex question (disguising two or more questions as one).  Logicians, influenced by scholastic logic, often gave these characteristic mistakes Latin names: compositio for composition, divisio for division, secundum quid et simpliciter for converse accident, ignoranti enlenchi for nonrelevant conclusion, and petitio principii for begging the question.

Consider three brief examples of fallacies from Aristotle’s original text.  Aristotle formulates the following amphiboly (which admittedly sounds awkward in English): “I wish that you the enemy may capture.”  (Sophistical Refutations, 4.166a7-8, Pickard-Cambridge.)  Clearly, the grammatical structure of the statement leaves it ambiguous as to whether the speaker is hoping that the enemy or “you” be captured.  In discussing complex question, he supplies the following perplexing example: “Ought one to obey the wise or one’s father?”  (Ibid., 12.173a21.)  Obviously, from a Greek perspective, one ought to obey both.  The problem is that the question has been worded in such a way that anyone who answers will be forced to reject one moral duty in order to embrace the other.  In fact, there are two separate questions here—Should one obey the wise?  Should one obey one’s father?—that have been illegitimately combined to produce a single question with a single answer.  Finally, Aristotle provides the following time-honoured example of affirming the consequent: “Since after the rain the ground is wet, we suppose that if the ground is wet, it has been raining; whereas that does not necessarily follow”  (Ibid., 5.167b5-8.)  Aristotle’s point is that assuming that the same effect never has more than one cause misconstrues the true nature of the world.  The same effect may have several causes.  Many of Aristotle’s examples have to do with verbal tricks which are entirely unconvincing—for example, the person who commits the fallacy of division by arguing that the number “5” is both even and odd because it can be divided into an even and an odd number: “2” and “3.”  (Ibid., 4.166a32-33.)  But the interest here is theoretical: figuring out where an obviously-incorrect argument or proposition went wrong.  We should note that much of this text, which deals with natural language argumentation, does not presuppose the syllogistic form.  Aristotle does spend a good bit of time considering how fallacies are related to one another.  Fallacy theory, it is worth adding, is a thriving area of research in contemporary argumentation theory.  Some of these issues are hotly debated.

16. Moral Reasoning

In the modern world, many philosophers have argued that morality is a matter of feelings, not reason.  Although Aristotle recognizes the connative (or emotional) side of morality, he takes a decidedly different tack.  As a virtue ethicist, he does not focus on moral law but views morality through the lens of character.  An ethical person develops a capacity for habitual decision-making that aims at good, reliable traits such as honesty, generosity, high-mindedness, and courage.  To modern ears, this may not sound like reason-at-work, but Aristotle argues that only human beings—that is, rational animals—are able to tell the difference between right and wrong.  He widens his account of rationality to include a notion of practical wisdom (phronesis), which he defines as “a true and reasoned state of capacity to act with regard to the things that are good or bad for man.”  (Nicomachean Ethics, VI.5.1140b4-5, Ross, Urmson).  The operation of practical wisdom, which is more about doing than thinking, displays an inductive-deductive pattern similar to science as represented in Figure 3.  It depends crucially on intuition or nous.  One induces the idea of specific virtues (largely, through an exercise of non-discursive reason) and then deduces how to apply these ideas to particular circumstances.  (Some scholars make a strict distinction between “virtue” (areté) understood as the mental capacity which induces moral ideas and “phronesis” understood as the mental capacity which applies these ideas, but the basic structure of moral thinking remains the same however strictly or loosely we define these two terms.)

Figure 3

The Inductive-Deductive Method of Aristotelian Ethics

We can distinguish then between moral induction and moral deduction.  In moral induction, we induce an idea of courage, honesty, loyalty, and so on.  We do this over time, beginning in our childhood, through habit and upbringing.  Aristotle writes that the successful moral agent “must be born with an eye, as it were, by which to judge rightly and choose what is truly good.”  (Ibid., VI.7.1114b6ff.)  Once this intuitive capacity for moral discernment has been sufficiently developed—once the moral eye is able to see the difference between right and wrong,—we can apply moral norms to the concrete circumstances of our own lives.  In moral deduction, we go on to apply the idea of a specific virtue to a particular situation.  We do not do this by formulating moral arguments inside our heads, but by making reasonable decisions, by doing what is morally required given the circumstances.  Aristotle refers, in this connection, to the practical syllogism which results “in a conclusion which is an action.” (Movement of Animals, 701a10ff, Farquharson.)  Consider a (somewhat simplified) example.   Suppose I induce the idea of promise-keeping as a virtue and then apply it to question of whether I should pay back the money I borrowed from my brother.  The corresponding theoretical syllogism would be:  Promise-keeping is good; giving back the money I owe my brother is an instance of promise-keeping; so giving the back the money I owe my brother is good.”  In the corresponding practical syllogism, I do not conclude with a statement:  “this act is good.”  I go out and pay back the money I owe my brother.  The physical exchange of money counts as the conclusion.  In Aristotle’s moral system, general moral principles play the role of an ostensible definition in science.  One induces a general principle and deduces a corresponding action.  Aristotle does believe that moral reasoning is a less rigorous form of reasoning than science, but chiefly because scientific demonstrations deal with universals whereas the practical syllogism ends a single act that must be fitted to contingent circumstances.  There is never any suggestion that morality is somehow arbitrary or subjective.  One could set out the moral reasoning process using the moral equivalent of an inductive syllogism and a scientific demonstration.

Although Aristotle provides a logical blueprint for the kind of reasoning that is going on in ethical decision-making, he obviously does not view moral decision-making as any kind of mechanical or algorithmic procedure.  Moral induction and deduction represent, in simplified form, what is going on.  Throughout his ethics, Aristotle emphasizes the importance of context.  The practice of morality depends then on a faculty of keen discernment that notices, distinguishes, analyzes, appreciates, generalizes, evaluates, and ultimately decides.  In the Nicomachean Ethics, he includes practical wisdom in his list of five intellectual virtues.  (Scholarly commentators variously explicate the relationship between the moral and the intellectual virtues.)  Aristotle also discusses minor moral virtues such as good deliberation (eubulia), theoretical moral understanding (sunesis), and experienced moral judgement (gnome).  And he equates moral failure with chronic ignorance or, in the case of weakness of will (akrasia), with intermittent ignorance.

17. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Complete Works of Aristotle.  Edited by Jonathan Barnes.  Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1984.
    • The standard scholarly collection of translations.
  • Aristotle in 23 Volumes.  Cambridge, M.A.: Harvard University Press; London: William Heinemann Ltd., 1944 and 1960.
    • A scholarly, bilingual edition.

b. Secondary Sources

This list is intended as a window on a diversity of approaches and problems.

  • Barnes, Jonathan, (Aristotle) Posterior Analytics. Oxford: Clarendon Press; New York : Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Biondi, Paolo.  Aristotle: Posterior Analytics II.19.  Quebec, Q.C.: Les Presses de l’Universite Laval, 2004.
  • Ebbesen, Sten, Commentators and Commentaries on Aristotle’s Sophistici Elenchi, Vol. 1: The Greek Tradition. Leiden: Brill, 1981.
  • Engberg-Pedersen, Troels.  “More on Aristotelian Epagoge.” Phronesis, 24 (1979): 301-319.
  • Englebretsen, George.  Three Logicians: Aristotle, Leibnitz, and Sommers and the Syllogistic.  Assen, Netherlands: Van Gorcum, 1981.
    • See also Sommers, below.
  • Garrett, Dan, and Edward Barbanell.  Encyclopedia of Empiricism. Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1997.
  • Govier, Trudy.  Problems in Argument Analysis and Evaluation.  Providence, R.I.: Floris, 1987.
  • Groarke, Louis. “A Deductive Account of Induction,” Science et Esprit, 52 (December 2000), 353-369.
  • Groarke, Louis. An Aristotelian Account of Induction: Creating Something From Nothing.  Montreal & Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press, 2009.
  • Hamlyn, D. W.  Aristotle’s De Anima Books II and III.  Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1974.
  • Hamlyn, D. W. “Aristotelian Epagoge.”  Phronesis 21 (1976): 167-184.
  • Irwin, Terence.  Aristotle’s First Principles.  Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1988.
  • Keyt, David.  “Deductive Logic,” in A Companion to Aristotle, George Anaganostopoulos, London: Blackwell, 2009, pp. 31-50.
  • Łukasiewicz, Jan.  Aristotle’s Syllogistic from the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic. Oxford University Press, 1957.
  • McCaskey, John, “Freeing Aristotelian Epagôgê from Prior Analytics II 23,” Apeiron, 40:4 (December, 2007), pp. 345–74.
  • McKirahan, Richard Jr.  Principles and Proofs: Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstrative Species.  Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Parry, William, and Edward Hacker. Aristotelian Logic. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Peters, F. E., Greek Philosophical Terms: A Historical Lexicon.  New York: NYU Press, 1967.
  • Rijk, Lambertus Marie de.  Aristotle: Semantics and Ontology.  Boston, M.A.: Brill, 2002.
  • Smith, Robin.  “Aristotle on the Uses of Dialectic,” Synthese , Vol. 96, No. 3, 1993, 335-358.
  • Smith, Robin. Aristotle, Prior Analytics.  Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1989.
  • Smith, Robin. “Aristotle’s Logic,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. E, Zalta. ed. Stanford, CA., 2000, 2007.
    • An excellent introduction to Aristotle’s logic (with a different focus).
  • Smith, Robin. “Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstration,” in A Companion to Aristotle, 52-65.
  • Sommers, Fred, and George Englebretsen, An Invitation to Formal Reasoning: The Logic of Terms. Aldershot UK: Ashgate, 2000.


Author Information

Louis F. Groarke
St. Francis Xavier University

Last updated: September 28, 2011 | Originally published: