When Aristotle articulated the central question of the group of writings we know as his Metaphysics, he said it was a question that would never cease to raise itself. He was right. He also regarded his own contributions to the handling of that question as belonging to the final phase of responding to it. I think he was right about that too. The Metaphysics is one of the most helpful books there is for contending with a question the asking of which is one of the things that makes us human. In our time that question is for the most part hidden behind a wall of sophistry, and the book that could lead us to rediscover it is even more thoroughly hidden behind a maze of misunderstandings.
Paul Shorey, a scholar whose not-too-bad translation of the Republic is the Hamilton edition of the Collected Works of Plato, has called the Metaphysics “a hopeless muddle” not to be made sense of by any “ingenuity of conjecture.” I think it is safe to say that more people have learned important things from Aristotle than from Professor Shorey, but what conclusion other than his can one come to about a work that has two books numbered one, that descends from the sublime description of the life of the divine intellect in its twelfth book to end with two books full of endless quarreling over minor details of the Platonic doctrine of forms, a doctrine Aristotle had already decisively refuted in early parts of the book, those parts, that is, in which he is not defending it? The book was certainly not written as one whole; it was compiled, and once one has granted that, must not one admit that it was compiled badly, crystallizing as it does an incoherent ambivalence toward the teachings of Plato? After three centuries in which no one has much interest in it at all, the Metaphysics becomes interesting to nineteenth century scholars just as a historical puzzle: how could such a mess have been put together?
I have learned the most from reading the Metaphysics on those occasions when I have adopted the working hypothesis that it was compiled by someone who understood Aristotle better than I or the scholars do, and that that someone (why not call him Aristotle?) thought that the parts made an intelligible whole, best understood when read in that order. My main business here will be to give you some sense of how the Metaphysics looks in its wholeness, but the picture I will sketch depends on several hypotheses independent of the main one. One cannot begin to read the Metaphysics without two pieces of equipment: one is a set of decisions about how to translate Aristotle’s central words. No translator of Aristotle known to me is of any help here; they will all befuddle you, more so in the Metaphysics even than in Aristotle’s other works. The other piece of equipment, and equally indispensable I think, is some perspective on the relation of the Metaphysics to the Platonic dialogues. In this matter the scholars, even the best of them, have shown no imagination at all. In the dialogues, in their view, Plato sets forth a “theory” by putting it into the mouth of Socrates. There is some room for interpretation, but on the whole we are all supposed to know that theory. Aristotle must accept that theory or reject it. If he appears to do both it is because passages written by some Platonist have been inserted into his text, or because things he wrote when he was young and a Platonist were lumped together with other things on similar subjects which he wrote when he was older and his thoughts were different and his own.
Table of Contents
- Aristotle and Plato
- Translating Aristotle
- The Meaning of Ousia (Being) in Plato
- Ousia in Aristotle
- The Doctrine of Categories
- The Central Question of the Metaphysics
- The World as Cosmos
- Forms, Wholeness, and Thinghood
- The Being of Sensible Things
- Matter and Form in Aristotle
- References and Further Reading
The Plato we are supposed to know from his dialogues is one who posited that, for every name we give to bodies in the world there is a bodiless being in another world, one while they are many, static while they are changing, perfect while they are altogether distasteful. Not surprisingly, those for whom this is Plato find his doctrine absurd, and welcome an Aristotle whom they find saying that being in its highest form is found in an individual man or horse, that mathematical things are abstractions from sensible bodies, and that, if there is an ideal man apart from men, in virtue of whom they are all called men, then there must be yet a third kind of man, in virtue of whom the form and the men can have the same name, and yet a fourth, and so on. You can’t stop adding new ideal men until you are willing to grant that it was absurd to add the first one, or anything at all beyond just plain men. This is hard-headed, tough-minded Aristotle, not to be intimidated by fancy, mystical talk, living in the world we live in and knowing it is the only world there is. This Aristotle, unfortunately, is a fiction, a projection of our unphilosophic selves. He lives only in a handful of sentences ripped out of their contexts. The true Aristotle indeed takes at face value the world as we find it and all our ordinary opinions about it–takes them, examines them, and finds them wanting. It is the world as we find it which continually, for Aristotle, shows that our ordinary, materialist prejudices are mistaken, and the abandonment of those prejudices shows in turn that the world as we found it was not a possible world, that the world as we must reflect upon it is a much richer world, mysterious and exciting.
Those of you for whom reading the Platonic dialogues was a battle you won by losing, an eye-opening experience from which, if there is no going forward, there is certainly no turning back, should get to know this Aristotle. But you will find standing in your way all those passages in which Aristotle seems to be discussing the dialogues and does so in a shallow way. Each dialogue has a surface in which Socrates speaks in riddles, articulates half-truths which invite qualification and correction, argues from answers given by others as though he shared their opinions, and pretends to be at a loss about everything. Plato never straightens things out for his readers, any more than Socrates does for his hearers. To do so would be to soothe us, to lull us to sleep as soon as we’ve begun to be distressed by what it feels like to be awake. Platonic writing, like Socratic talk, is designed to awaken and guide philosophic thinking, by presenting, defending, and criticizing plausible responses to important questions. The Platonic-Socratic words have only done their work when we have gone beyond them, but they remain in the dialogues as a collection of just what they were intended to be — unsatisfactory assertions. Hippocrates Apostle finds 81 places in the Metaphysics where Aristotle disagrees with Plato. It is not surprising that Aristotle himself uses Plato’s name in almost none of those places. Aristotle is addressing an audience of students who have read the dialogues and is continuing the work of the dialogues. Many, perhaps most, of Aristotle’s students would, like scholars today, find theories and answers in Plato’s dialogues. Aristotle would not be earning his keep as a teacher of philosophy if he did not force his students beyond that position. Aristotle constantly refers to the dialogues because they are the best and most comprehensive texts he and his students share. Aristotle disagrees with Plato about some things, but less extensively and less deeply than he disagrees with every other author that he names. The Metaphysics inevitably looks like an attack on Plato just because Plato’s books are so much better than anything left by Thales, Empedocles or anyone else.
My first assumption, then, was that the Metaphysics is one book with one complex argument, and my second is that, in cohering within itself, the Metaphysics may cohere with the Platonic dialogues. I assume that discussions in the dialogues may be taken as giving flesh to Aristotle’s formulations, while they in turn may be taken as giving shape to those discussions. One need only try a very little of this to find a great deal beginning to fall into place. For example, listen to Aristotle in Book I, Chapter 9 of the Metaphysics: “the Forms …are not the causes of motion or of any other change …And they do not in any way help either towards the knowledge of the other things..or towards their existence …Moreover, all other things do not come to be from the Forms in any of the usual senses of ‘from.’ And to say that the Forms are patterns and that the other things participate in them is to use empty words and poetic metaphors.” A devastating attack on Plato, is it not? Or is it? Aristotle says that positing the Forms explains no single thing that one wants to know. But doesn’t Socrates say in the Phaedo that to call beauty itself the cause of beauty in beautiful things is a “safe but stupid answer”–that one must begin with it but must also move beyond it? Again, everyone knows that the Platonic Socrates claimed that the forms were separate from the things in the sensible world, off by themselves, while Aristotle insisted that the forms were in the things. Recall the Phaedo passage just referred to. Does not Socrates say that the cause of heat in a hot thing is not heat itself but fire? Where, then, is the form for Socrates? Aristotle taught that the causes of characteristics of things were to be looked for not in a separate world of forms but in the primary instances of those characteristics right here in the world. This doctrine may seem to be a rejection of Plato’s chief postulate, but listen to Aristotle himself explain it in Book II, Chapter 1 of the Metaphysics: “of things to which the same predicate belongs, the one to which it belongs in the highest degree is that in virtue of which it belongs also to the others. For example, fire is the hottest of whatever is truly called ‘hot’, for fire is cause of hotness in the others.” Do you hear an echo? Again, Aristotle teaches that form is to be understood as always at work, never static as is the Platonic form, or is it? Do not the Stranger and Theaetetus agree in the Sophist that it would be “monstrous and absurd” to deny that life, motion, and soul belong to the intelligible things? Do they not indeed define being as a power to act or be affected? Does not Socrates in the Theaetetus entertain the same definition when he construes the world as made up of an infinity of powers to act and be affected? Plato’s dialogues do not set forth a theory of forms. They set forth a way to get started with the work of philosophic inquiry, and Aristotle moves altogether within that way. Much in his writings that is a closed book to those who insist on seeing him as Plato’s opponent opens up when one lets the dialogues serve as the key.
Then we shall not hesitate to take whatever light we can find in the dialogues and shine it on Aristotle’s text at least to see if anything comes into the light. And this brings me to a third assumption: the English word substance is of no help in understanding Aristotle’s word ousia. The central question of theMetaphysics is, What is ousia? Aristotle claims that it is the same as the question, What is being? and that it is in fact the question everyone who has ever done any philosophy or physics has been asking. Since we do not share Aristotle’s language we cannot know what claim he is making until we find a way to translate ousia. The translators give us the word substance only because earlier translators and commentators did so, while they in turn did so because still earlier translators into Latin rendered it assubstantia. Early modern philosophy, in all the European languages, is full of discussions of substance which stem from Latin versions of Aristotle. Though oral traditions keep meanings alive this written tradition has buried Aristotle’s meaning irretrievably. We must ignore it, and take our access to the meaning of ousia from Plato’s use of it, but before we do so a quick look at where the word substance came from may help us bury it.
The earliest Latin translations of Aristotle tried a number of ways of translating ousia, but by the fourth century AD, when St. Augustine lived, only two remained in use: essentia was made as a formal parallel to ousia, from the feminine singular participle of the verb to be plus an abstract noun ending, so that the whole would be roughly equivalent to an English translation being-ness; the second translation,substantia, was an attempt to get closer to ousia by interpreting Aristotle’s use of it as something like “persisting substratum”. Augustine, who had no interest in interpreting Aristotle, thought that, while everything in the world possesses substantia, a persisting underlying identity, the fullness of being suggested by the word essentia could belong to no created thing but only to their creator. Aristotle, who is quite explicit on the point that creation is impossible, believed no such thing, and Augustine didn’t think he did. But Augustine’s own thinking offered a consistent way to distinguish two Latin words whose use had become muddled. Boethius, in his commentaries on Aristotle, followed Augustine’s lead, and hence always translated ousia as substantia, and his usage seems to have settled the matter. And so a word designed by the anti-Aristotelian Augustine to mean a low and empty sort of being turns up in our translations of the word whose meaning Aristotle took to be the highest and fullest sense of being. Descartes, in his Meditations, uses the word substance only with his tongue in his cheek; Locke explicitly analyzes it as an empty notion of an I-don’t-know-what; and soon after the word is laughed out of the vocabulary of serious philosophic endeavor. It is no wonder that the Metaphysics ceased to have any influence on living thinking: its heart had been cut out of it by its friends.
What does ousia mean? It is already a quirky, idiomatic word in ordinary use when Plato gets hold of it. By a quirk of our own language one may say indeed that it means substance, but only, I repeat only, in the sense in which a rich man is called a man of substance. You may safely allow your daughter to marry him because you know where he will be and what he will be doing tomorrow and twenty years from now.Ousia meant permanent property, real estate, non-transferable goods: not the possessions we are always using up or consuming but those that remain–land, houses, wealth of the kind one never spends since it breeds new wealth with no expense of itself. When Socrates asks Meno for the ousia of the bee he is not using a technical philosophical term but a metaphor: what is the estate of a bee that each one inherits simply by being born a bee? A man of substance who has permanent wealth is who he is because of what he owns. A bee is to his permanent and his variable characteristics as a man is to his permanent and his spendable wealth. The metaphor takes a second step when applied to virtue: the varying instances of virtue in a man, a woman, a slave, and the rest must all have some unvarying core which makes them virtues. There must be some single meaning to which we always refer when we pronounce anything a virtue. This is the step Socrates continually insists that Meno must take. But remember, in the slave-boy scene, Socrates twice entices the slave-boy into giving plausible incorrect answers about the side of the double square. Is there an ousia of virtue? Socrates uses the word not as the result of an induction or abstraction or definition, but by stretching an already strained metaphor. People have disposable goods which come and go and ousiatic goods which remain; bees have some characteristics in which they differ, and others in which they share; the virtues differ, but are they the same in anything but name? Even if they are, must it be a definition that they share? Not all men have ousia. Ordinarily only a few men do. The rest of us work for them, sell to them, marry them, gather in the hills to destroy them, but do not have what they have. Perhaps there are only a few virtues, or only one.
The word ousia, as Plato’s Socrates handles it, seems to be a double-edged weapon. It explicitly rejects Meno’s way of saying what virtue is, but implicitly suggests that the obvious alternative may fail as well. If virtue is not simply a meaningless label used ambiguously for many unconnected things, that does not mean that it must unambiguously name the same content in each of the things it names. Since ousia is our metaphor, let us ask what wealth means. If a poor man has a hut and a cow and some stored-up food, are they his wealth? He is certainly not wealthy. On the other hand, King Lear says that “our basest beggars Are in poorest thing superfluous”; no human life is cut so fine as to lack anything beyond what satisfies bare need. The beggar, like the family on welfare, does not have the means to satisfy need, but need not for that reason forego those possessions which give life comfort or continuity. His wealth is derived from the wealth of others. The small farmer may maintain something of the independence a wealthy man enjoys, but one bad year could wipe him out. He will either accumulate enough to become wealthy himself, or his life will remain a small-scale analogy to that of the wealthy. Wealth means, first of all, only that which a few people have and the rest of us lack, but because it means that, it also, at the same time, means secondarily something that all of us possess. There is an ambiguity at work in the meaning of the word “wealth” which is not a matter of a faulty vocabulary and not a matter of language at all: it expresses the way things are. Wealth of various kinds exists by derivation from and analogy to wealth in the emphatic sense. Indeed Meno, who spontaneously defines virtue by listing virtues, is equally strongly inclined to say that the power to rule over men and possessions is the only virtue there is. He cannot resolve the logical difficulties Socrates raises about his answers, but they are all resolvable. Meno in fact believes that virtue is ousia in its simple sense of big money, and that women, children, and slaves can only have virtue derivatively and ambiguously. Socrates’ question is one of those infuriatingly ironic games he is always playing. The ousia of virtue, according to Meno and Gorgias, is ousia.
When the word ousia turns up in texts of Aristotle, it is this hidden history of its use, and not its etymology, which is determining its meaning. First of all, the word fills a gap in the language of being, since Greek has no word for thing. The two closest equivalents are to on and to chrema. To on simply means whatever is, and includes the color blue, the length two feet, the action walking, and anything at all that can be said to be. To chrema means a thing used, used up, spent, or consumed; any kind of possession, namely, that is not ousia. ousia holds together, remains, and makes its possessor emphatically somebody. In the vocabulary of money, ousia is to to chremata as whatever remains constant in a thing is to all theonta that come and go. ousia also carries with it the sense of something that belongs somehow to all but directly and fully only to a few. The word is ready-made to be the theme of Aristotle’s investigation of being, because both the word and the investigation were designed by Plato. For Aristotle, the inquiry into the nature of being begins with the observation that being is meant in many ways. It is like Meno’s beginning, and it must be subjected to the same Socratic questioning.
Suppose that there is some one core of meaning to which we refer whenever we say that something is. What is its content? Hegel says of being as being:
“it is not to be felt, or perceived by sense, or pictured in imagination… it is mere abstraction… the absolutely negative… just Nothing.”
And isn’t he right, as Parmenides was before him? Leave aside all those characteristics in which beings differ, and what is left behind? To Aristotle, this means that being is not a universal or a genus. If being is the comprehensive class to which everything belongs, how does it come to have sub-classes? It would have to be divided with respect to something outside itself. Beings would have to be distinguished by possessing or failing to possess some characteristic, but that characteristic would have to be either a class within being, already separated off from the rest by reference to something prior, or a non-being. Since both are impossible, being must come already divided: the highest genera or ultimate classes of things must be irreducibly many. This is Aristotle’s doctrine of the categories, and according to him being means at least eight different things.
The categories have familiar names: quality, quantity, relation, time, place, action, being-acted upon. The question Socrates asked about things, What is it?, is too broad, since it can be answered truly with respect to any of the categories that apply, and many times in some of them. For example, I’ll describe something to you: it is backstage now; it is red; it is three feet high; it is lying down and breathing. I could continue telling you what it is in this fashion for as long as I pleased and you would not know what it is. It is an Irish setter. What is different about that last answer? To be an Irish setter is not to be a quality or quantity or time or action but to be a whole which comprises many ways of being in those categories, and much change and indeterminacy in them. The redness, three-foot-high-ness, respiration and much else cohere in a thing which I have named in its thinghood by calling it an Irish setter. Aristotle calls this way of being ousia. Aristotle’s logical works reflect upon the claims our speech makes about the world. The principal result of Aristotle’s inquiry into the logical categories of being is, I think, the claim that the thinghood of things in the world is never reducible in our speech to any combination of qualities, quantities, relations, actions, and so on: that ousia or thinghood must be a separate category. What happens when I try to articulate the being of a thing such as an Irish setter? I define it as a dog with certain properties. But what then is a dog? It is an animal with certain properties, and an animal is an organism with certain properties, and an organism is a thing with the property life. At each level I meet, as dog, animal, organism, what Aristotle calls secondary ousia or secondary thinghood.
I set out to give an account of what makes a certain collection of properties cohere as a certain thing, and I keep separating off some of them and telling you that the rest cohere as a whole. At my last step, when I say that an organism is a living thing, the problem of secondary thinghood is present in its nakedness. Our speech, no matter how scientific, must always leave the question of the hanging-together of things as things a question.
Thus the logical inquiries bequeath to the Metaphysics its central question, which we are now in a position to translate. The question that was asked of old and will always be asked by anyone who is alive enough to wonder about anything is, What is being? What is a thing? What is the thinghood of things? What makes our world a world of things at all? We are here at the deepest postulate of Aristotelian philosophizing: the integrity of the world as a world and of anything in it which endures as itself for any time at all, is not self-explanatory, is something to be wondered at, is caused.
We are taught that a moving thing, if nothing disturbs it, will continue moving forever. Do you believe that? It is certainly true that a heavy thing in motion is as hard to stop as it was to set in motion, and that we cannot step out of moving automobiles without continuing, for a while, to share their motions. But these are evidences of persistence of motion, not at all the same thing as inertia of motion. There is no evidence of the latter. In principle there cannot be, because we cannot abolish all the world to observe an undisturbed moving thing. There is a powerful and in its way, beautiful, account of the world which assumes inertia, appealing to those experiences which suggest that motion at an unchanging speed is a state no different from that of rest. The hidden premise which leads from that step to the notion of inertia is the assumption that rest is an inert state. If it is not, the same evidence could lead to the conclusion that an unchanging speed is a fragile and vulnerable thing, as unlikely and as hard to come by as an unchanging anything. How can a balloon remain unchanged? It does so only so long as the air inside pushes out no harder and no less hard than the air outside pushes in. Is the air inside the balloon at rest? Can it be at rest as long as it is performing a task? Can the balloon be at rest if the air inside it cannot be? It can certainly remain in a place, like other apparently inert things, say a table. If you pulled the legs from under a table the top would fall, and if you removed the top the legs would fall. Leave them together and leave them alone and they do not move, but is the table at rest? Surely no more so than a pair of arm wrestlers, straining every muscle but unable to budge each other, can be said to be resting. But can’t we find an inert thing anywhere in the world? How about a single lump of rock? But if I throw it in the air it will return to find a resting place. It seems to rest only when something blocks it, and if I let it rest on my hand or my head, something will make me uncomfortable. Can the rock be doing nothing? And if we cannot find inertia in a rock, where could it be? An animal is either full of circulating and respirating or it is rotting, and the same seems true of plants. But what in the world is not animal-like, plant-like, rock-like, or table-like? The world contains living and non-living natural beings, and it contains products of human making, and all of them are busy. From Aristotle’s wondering and wonderful perspective, everything in the world is busy just continuing to be itself. This is not a “theory” of Aristotle’s; it is a way of bringing the world to sight with the questioning intellect awake. Try that way of looking on for size: the world has nothing to lose for ceasing to be taken for granted. Consider an analogy. Ptolemy is content to say that Venus and Mercury happen to have the same longitudinal period as the sun and that Mars, Jupiter, and Saturn all happen to lag just as far behind the sun in any time as they have moved in anomaly. Copernicus, in the most passionate and convincing part of his argument, shows that these facts can be explained. Lucretius (whom we may substitute for Aristotle’s favorite materialist, Empedocles) thought that cats and dogs and giraffes just happened to come about by accumulation, like the sands on the beach. Lucretius’ failure to wonder at a giraffe, his reduction of the living to the blind and dead, is, from Aristotle’s standpoint, a failure to recognize what is truly one, what is not just a heap, what is genuinely a thing.
The least thoughtful, least alert way of being in the world is to regard everything which remains itself as doing so causelessly, inertly. To seek a cause for the being-as-it-is of any thing is already to be in the grip of the question Aristotle says must always be asked. To seek the causes and sources of the being-as-it-is of everything that is, is to join Aristotle in his Copernican revolution which regards every manifestation of persistence, order, or recurrence as a marvel, an achievement. That everything in the world disclosed to our senses is in a ceaseless state of change, most of us would grant. That the world nevertheless hangs together enough to be experienced at all is a fact so large that we rarely take notice of it. But the two together–change, and a context of persistence out of which change can emerge–force one to acknowledge some non-human cause at work: for whichever side of the world–change or rest, order or dissolution–is simply its uncaused, inert way, the other side must be the result of effort. Something must be at work in the world, hidden to us, visible only in its effects, pervading all that is, and it must be either a destroyer or a preserver.
That much seems to me to be demonstrable, but the next step is a difficult one to take because the world presents to us two faces: the living and the non-living. The thinghood of living things consists in organized unity, maintained through effort, at work in a variety of activities characteristic of each species; but a rock or a flame or some water or some dirt or some air is a thing in a much different way, unified only by accidental boundaries, indifferent to being divided or heaped together, at work only in some one local motion, up or down. Which is the aberration, life or non-life? For Aristotle the choice need not be made, since the distinction between the two forms of being only results from a confusion. Flesh, blood, bone, and hair would seem inorganic and inanimate if they were not organized into and animated as, say a cat. But earth, air, fire, and water, all of it, is always organized into and animate as the cosmos. The heavens enclose an organized body which has a size, a shape, and a hierarchical structure all of which it maintains by ceaseless, concerted activity. You may think that in believing this, Aristotle betrays an innocence which we cannot recover. But not only Aristotle and Ptolemy, but also Copernicus and Kepler believed the visible heaven to be a cosmos, and not only they, but also, amazingly, Newton himself. In our century, Einstein calculated the volume of the universe, and cosmology has once again become a respectable scientific pursuit. Moderns, for whom the spherical motion of the heavens no longer indicates that the heavens have boundaries, draw the same conclusion from the fact that there is darkness. Anyone who would take the assertion that his outlook is modern to include the denial that there is a cosmos would make a very shallow claim, one having more to do with poetic fashion than with reasoned conviction. The question of the cosmos has not been made obsolete, and the very least we must admit is that the appearance of an inorganic, inanimate nature is not conclusive and would result from our human-sized perspective whether there is a cosmos or not.
If the world is a cosmos, then it is one more instance of the kind of being that belongs to every animal and plant in it. And if that is so, there is nothing left to display any other kind of being. Try it: take inventory. What is there? The color red is, only if it is the color of some thing. Color itself is, only if it is some one color, and the color of a thing. The relation “taller than” is, only if it is of two or more things. What has being but is not a thing must depend on some thing for its being. But on the other hand a mere thing, mere matter as we call it, using the word differently than Aristotle ever does, is an impossibility too. Relatively inert, rock-like being is the being of a part of what comes only in wholes–cosmos, plant, or animal. And all man-made things must borrow their material from natural things and their very holding-together from the natural tendencies of the parts of the cosmos. To be is to be alive; all other being is borrowed being. Any comprehensive account of things must come to terms with the special being of animals and plants: for Lucretius, living things are not marvels but a problem which he solves by dissolving them into the vast sea of inert purposelessness. For Aristotle, as for Plato, wonder is not a state to be dissolved but a beckoning to be followed, and for Aristotle the wonderful animals and plants point the way to being itself, to that being qua being which is the source of all being, for we see it in the world in them and only in them.
Thus when Aristotle begins in Book 7 of the Metaphysics to ask what makes a thing a thing, he narrows the question to apply only to living things. All other being is, in one way or another, their effect. He is asking for their cause. At that point, his inquiry into the causes and sources of being itself, simply as being, merges with the inquiry in Book 2 of his Physics, where the question is, What is nature? The answer, as well, must be the same, and just as Aristotle concludes that nature is form, he concludes that being is form. Does the material of an animal make it what it is? Yes, but it cannot be the entire or even principal cause. If there is anything that is not simply the sum of its parts, it is an animal. It is continually making itself, by snatching suitable material from its environment and discarding unsuitable material. Add some sufficiently unsuitable material, like arsenic, and the sum of parts remains, but the animal ceases to be. The whole which is not accounted for by the enumeration of its parts is the topic of the last section of theTheaetetus, where Socrates offers several playful images of that kind of being: a wagon, a melody, the number six, and the example discussed at most length, which Aristotle borrows, the syllable.
Aristotle insists that the syllable is never the sum of its letters. Socrates, of course, argues both sides of the question, and Theaetetus agrees both times. Let’s try it ourselves. Take the word “put”, p-u-t. voice the letters separately, as well as you can, and say them in succession, as rapidly as you can. I think you will find that, as long as you attempt to add sound to sound, you will have a grunt surrounded by two explosions of breath. When you voice the whole syllable as one sound, the a is already present when you begin sounding the p, and the t sound is already shaping the u. Try to pronounce the first two letters and add the third as an afterthought, and you will get two sounds. I have tried all this, and think it’s true, but you must decide for yourself. Aristotle says that the syllable is the letters, plus something else besides; Socrates calls the something else a form, an eidos, while Aristotle calls it the thinghood of the thing. When I pronounce the syllable “put”, I must have in mind the whole syllable in its wholeness before I can voice any of its parts in such a way as to make them come out parts of it. Now a syllable is about as transitory a being as one could imagine: it is made of breath, and it is gone as soon as it is uttered. But a craftsman works the same way as a maker of syllables. If he simply begins nailing and gluing together pieces of wood, metal, and leather, he is not likely to end up with a wagon; to do so, he must have the whole shape and work of the wagon in mind in each of his joinings and fittings. Even so, when he is finished, what he has produced is only held together by nails and glue. As soon as it is made, the wagon begins falling apart, and it does so the more, the more it is used. All the more perplexing then, is the animal or plant. It is perpetually being made and re-made after the form of its species, yet there is no craftsman at work on it. It is a composite of material and form, yet it is the material in it that is constantly being used up and replaced, while the form remains intact. The form is not in any artist’s imagination, nor can it be an accidental attribute of its material. In the Physics, nature was traced back to form, and in the first half of the Metaphysics all being is traced to the same source. But what is form? Where is it? Is it a cause or is it caused? Most important of all, does it have being alone, on its own, apart from bodies? Does it emerge from the world of bodies, or is a body a thing impossible to be unless a form is somehow already present for it to have? Or is there something specious about the whole effort to make form either secondary to material or primary? Are they perhaps equal and symmetrical aspects of being, inseparable, unranked? Just as ultimate or first material, without any characteristics supplied by form, cannot be, why should not a pure form, not the form of anything, be regarded as its opposite pole and as equally impossible? Or have we perhaps stumbled on a nest of unanswerable questions? If form is the first principle of the science of physics, might it not be a first principle simply, behind which one cannot get, to which one may appeal for explanation but about which one cannot inquire? Aristotle says that if there were not things apart from bodies, physics would be first philosophy. But he calls physics second philosophy, and half theMetaphysics lies on the other side of the questions we have been posing. It consists in the uncovering of beings not disclosed to our senses, beings outside of and causal with respect to what we naively and inevitably take to be the whole world.
Aristotle marks the center and turning point of the Metaphysics with these words: “One must inquire about (form), for this is the greatest impasse. Now it is agreed that some of what is perceptible arethings, and so one must search first among these. For it is preferable to proceed toward what is better known. For learning occurs in all things in this way: through what is by nature less known toward the things more known. And just as in matters of action the task is to make the things that are good completely be good for each person, from out of the things that seem good to each, so also the task here is, from out of the things more known to one, to make the things known by nature known to him. Now what is known and primary to each of us is often known slightly, and has little or nothing of being; nevertheless, from the things poorly known but known to one, one must try to know the things that are known completely.” (1029a 33 – b 11) The forest is dark, but one cannot get out of it without passing through it, carefully, calmly, attentively. It will do no good to move in circles. The passage just quoted connects with the powerful first sentence of the Metaphysics: “All human beings are by nature stretched out toward a state of knowing.” Our natural condition is one of frustration, of being unable to escape a task of which the goal is out of reach and out of sight. Aristotle here likens our frustration as theoretical beings to our condition as practical beings: unhappiness has causes–we achieve it by seeking things–and if we can discover what we were seeking we might be able to make what is good ours. Similarly, if we cannot discern the goal of wisdom, we can at least begin examining the things that stand in our way.
The next section of the Metaphysics, from Book 7, Chapter 4 through Book 9, is the beginning of an intense forward motion. These books are a painstaking clarification of the being of the things disclosed to our senses. It is here that Aristotle most heavily uses the vocabulary that is most his own, and everything he accomplishes in these books depends on the self-evidence of the meanings of these expressions. It is these books especially which Latinizing translators turn into gibberish. Words like essence, individual, and actuality must either be vague or be given arbitrary definitions. The words Aristotle uses are neither vague nor are they conceptual constructions; they call forth immediate, direct experiences which one must have at hand to see what Aristotle is talking about. They are not the kinds of words that books can explain; they are words of the kind that people must share before there can be books. That is why understanding a sentence of Aristotle is so often something that comes suddenly, in an insight that seems discontinuous from the puzzlement that preceded it. It is simply a matter of directing one’s gaze. We must try to make sense of Books 7-9 because they are crucial to the intention of the Metaphysics. Aristotle has an argument independent of those books, which he makes in Book 8 of the Physics and uses again in Book 12 of the Metaphysics that there must be an immortal, unchanging being, ultimately responsible for all wholeness and orderliness in the sensible world. And he is able to go on in Book 12 to discover a good deal about that being. One could, then, skip from the third chapter of Book 7 to Book 12, and, having traced being to form, trace form back to its source. Aristotle would have done that if his whole intention had been to establish that the sensible world has a divine source, but had he done so he would have left no foundation for reversing the dialectical motion of his argument to understand the things in the world on the basis of their sources. Books 7-9 provide that foundation.
The constituents of the world we encounter with our senses are not sensations. The sensible world is not a mosaic of sensible qualities continuous with or adjacent to one another, but meets our gaze organized into things which stand apart, detached from their surroundings. I can indicate one of them to you by the mere act of pointing, because it has its own boundaries and holds them through time. I need not trace out the limits of the region of the visual field to which I refer your attention, because the thing thrusts itself out from, holds itself aloof from what is visible around it, making that visible residue mere background. My pointing therefore has an object, and it is an object because it keeps being itself, does not change randomly or promiscuously like Proteus, but holds together sufficiently to remain the very thing at which I pointed. This way of being, Aristotle calls being a “this”. If I want to point out to you just this red of just this region of this shirt, I will have to do a good deal more than just point. .A “this” as Aristotle speaks of it is what comes forth to meet the act of pointing, is that for which Ã need not point and say “not that or that or that but just this,” but need do nothing but point, since it effects its own separation from what it is not.
A table, a chair, a rock, a painting–each is a this, but a living thing is a this in a special way. It is the author of its own this-ness. It appropriates from its surroundings, by eating and drinking and breathing, what it organizes into and holds together as itself. This work of self-separation from its environment is never finished but must go on without break if the living thing is to be at all. Let us consider as an example of a living this, some one human being. Today his skin is redder than usual, because he has been in the sun; there is a cut healing on his hand because he chopped onions two days ago; he is well educated, because, five years ago, his parents had the money and taste to send him to Harvard. All these details, and innumerably many more, belong to this human being. But in Aristotle’s way of speaking, the details I have named are incidental to him: he is not sunburned, wounded on the hand, or Harvard-educated because he is a human being. He is each of those things because his nature bumped into that of something else and left him with some mark, more or less intended, more or less temporary, but in any case aside from what he is on his own, self-sufficiently. What he is on his own, as a result of the activity that makes him be at all, is: two-legged, sentient, breathing, and all the other things he is simply as a human being. There is a difference between all the things he happens to be and the things he necessarily is on account of what he is. Aristotle formulates the latter, the kind of being that belongs to a thing not by happenstance but inevitably, as the “what it kept on being in the course of being at all” for a human being, or a duck, or a rosebush. The phrase to en einai is Aristotle’s answer to the Socratic question, ti esti? What is a giraffe? Find some way of articulating all the things that every giraffe always is, and you will have defined the giraffe. What each of them is throughout its life, is the product at any instant for any one of them, of the activity that is causing it to be. That means that the answer to the question “What is a giraffe?”, and the answer to the question “What is this giraffe?” are the same. Stated generally, Aristotle’s claim is that a this, which is in the world on its own, self-sufficiently, has a what-it-always-was-to-be, and is just its what-it-always-was-to-be. This is not a commonplace thought, but it is a comprehensible one; compare it with the translators’ version, “a per-se individual is identical with its essence.”
The living thing as it is present to my looking seems to be richer, fuller, more interesting than it can possibly be when it is reduced to a definition in speech, but this is a confusion. All that belongs to the living thing that is not implied by the definition of its species belongs to it externally, as a result of its accidental interactions with the other things in its environment. The definition attempts to penetrate to what it is in itself, by its own activity of making itself be whole and persist. There is nothing fuller than the whole, nothing richer than the life which is the winning and expressing of that wholeness, nothing more interesting than the struggle it is always waging unnoticed, a whole world of priority deeper and more serious than the personal history it must drag along with the species-drama it is constantly enacting. The reduction of the living thing to what defines it is like the reduction of a rectangular block of marble to the form of Hermes: less is more. Strip away the accretion of mere facts, and what is left is that without which even those facts could not have gained admittance into the world: the forever vulnerable foundation of all that is in the world, the shaping, ruling form, the incessant maintenance of which is the only meaning of the phrase self-preservation. Indeed even the bodily material of the living thing is present in the world only as active, only as forming itself into none of the other things it might have been but just this one thoroughly defined animal or plant. And this, finally, is Aristotle’s answer to the question, What is form? Form is material at work according to a persisting definiteness of kind. Aristotle’s definition of the soul in De Anima, soul is the being-at-work-staying-the-same of an organized body, becomes the definition of form in Book 8 of the Metaphysics, and is, at that stage of the inquiry, his definition of being.
Book 9 spells out the consequences of this clarification of form. Form cannot be derivative from or equivalent with material, because material on its own must be mere possibility. It cannot enter the world until it has achieved definiteness by getting to work in some way, and it cannot even be thought except as the possibility of some form. Books 7-9 demonstrate that materiality is a subordinate way of being. The living body does not bring form into the world, it must receive form to come into the world. Form is primary and casual, and the original source of all being in the sensible world must be traced beyond the sensible world, to that which confers unity on forms themselves. If forms had no integrity of their own, the world and things could not hang together and nothing would be. At the end of Book 9, the question of being has become the question of formal unity, the question, What makes each form one? In the woven texture of the organization of the Metaphysics, what comes next, at the beginning of Book 10, is a laying out of all the ways things may be one. Glue, nails, and rope are of no use for the problem at hand, nor, any longer, are natural shapes and motions, which have been shown to have a derivative sort of unity. All that is left in Aristotle’s array of possibilities is the unity of that of which the thinking or the knowing is one.
This thread of the investigation, which we may call for convenience the biological one, converges in Book 12 with a cosmological one. The animal and plant species take care of their own perpetuation by way of generation, but what the parents pass on to the offspring is an identity which must hold together thanks to a timeless activity of thinking. The cosmos holds together in a different way: it seems to be literally and directly eternal by way of a ceaseless repetition of patterns of locomotion. An eternal motion cannot result from some other motion, but must have an eternal, unchanging cause. Again, Aristotle lays out all the possibilities. What can cause a motion without undergoing a motion? A thing desired can, and so can a thing thought. Can you think of a third? Aristotle says that there are only these two, and that, moreover, the first reduces to the second. When I desire an apple it is the fleshy apple and not the thought of it toward which I move, but it is the thought or imagining of the fleshy apple that moves me toward the apple. The desired object causes motion only as an object of thought. Just as the only candidate left to be the source of unity of form among the animals and plants was the activity of thinking, so again the only possible unmoved source for the endless circlings of the stars is an eternal activity of thinking. Because it is deathless and because the heavens and nature and all that is depend upon it, Aristotle calls this activity God. Because it is always altogether at work, nothing that is thought by it is ever outside or apart from it: it is of thinking, simply. Again, because it is always altogether at work, nothing of it is ever left over outside of or apart from its work of thinking: it is thinking, simply. It is the pure holding-together of the pure holdable-together, activity active, causality caused. The world is, in all its being most deeply, and in its deepest being wholly, intelligible. So far is Aristotle from simply assuming the intelligibility of things, that he requires twelve books of argument to account for it. All being is dependent on the being of things; among things, the artificial are derived from the natural; because there is a cosmos, all natural things have being as living things; because all living things depend on either a species-identity or an eternal locomotion, there must be a self-subsisting activity of thinking.
The fact that there are a Book 13 and a Book 14 to the Metaphysics indicates that, in Aristotle’s view, the question of being has not yet undergone its last transformation. With the completion of Book 12, the question of being becomes: What is the definition of the world? What is the primary intelligible structure that implies all that is permanent in the world? Books 13 and 14 of the Metaphysics examine the only two answers that anyone has ever proposed to that question outside of myths. They are: that the divine thinking is a direct thinking of all the animal and plant species, and that it is a thinking of the mathematical sources of things. The conclusions of these two books are entirely negative. The inquiry into being itself cannot come to rest by transferring to the divine source the species-identities which constitute the world, nor can they be derived from their mathematical aspects. Aristotle’s final transformation of the question of being is into a question. Books 13 and 14 are for the sake of rescuing the question as one which does not and cannot yield to a solution but insists on being faced and thought directly. Repeatedly, through the Metaphysics, Aristotle says that the deepest things must be simple. One cannot speak the truth about them, nor even ask, a question about them, because they have no parts. They have no articulation in speech, but only contact with that which thinks. The ultimate question of the Metaphysics, which is at once What is all being at its roots? and What is the life of God?, and toward which the whole Metaphysics has been designed to clear the way, takes one beyond the limits of speech itself. The argument of the Metaphysics begins from our direct encounter with the sensible world, absorbs that world completely into speech, and carries its speech to the threshold of that on which world and speech depend. The shape of the book is a zig-zag, repeatedly encountering the inexpressible simple things and veering away. By climbing to that life which is the being-at-work of thinking, and then ending with a demonstration of what that life is not, Aristotle leaves us to disclose that life to ourselves in the only way possible, in the privacy of lived thinking. The Metaphysics is not an incomplete work: it is the utmost gift that a master of words can give.
- Aristotle, Metaphysics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 1999.
- Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2002.
- Aristotle, On the Soul, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 2001.
- Aristotle, Poetics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2006.
- Aristotle, Physics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Rutgers U. P., 1995.
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