Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Aristotle: Motion and its Place in Nature

aristotleAristotle’s account of motion can be found in the Physics. By motion, Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) understands any kind of change. He defines motion as the actuality of a potentiality. Initially, Aristotle's definition seems to involve a contradiction. However, commentators on the works of Aristotle, such as St. Thomas Aquinas, maintain that this is the only way to define motion.

In order to adequately understand Aristotle's definition of motion it is necessary to understand what he means by actuality and potentiality. Aristotle uses the words energeia and entelechia interchangeably to describe a kind of action. A linguistic analysis shows that, by actuality, Aristotle means both energeia, which means being-at-work, and entelechia, which means being-at-an-end. These two words, although they have different meanings, function as synonyms in Aristotle's scheme. For Aristotle, to be a thing in the world is to be at work, to belong to a particular species, to act for an end and to form material into enduring organized wholes. Actuality, for Aristotle, is therefore close in meaning to what it is to be alive, except it does not carry the implication of mortality.

From the Middle Ages to modern times, commentators disagreed on the interpretation of Aristotle’s account of motion. An accurate rendering of Aristotle's definition must include apparently inconsistent propositions: (a) that motion is rest, and (b) that a potentiality, which must be, if anything, a privation of actuality, is at the same time that actuality of which it is the lack. St. Thomas Aquinas was prepared to take these propositions seriously. St. Thomas observes that to say that something is in motion is just to say that it is both what it is already and something else that it is not yet. Accordingly, motion is the mode in which the future belongs to the present, it is the present absence of just those particular absent things which are about to be. St. Thomas thus resolves the apparent contradiction between potentiality and actuality in Aristotle's definition of motion by arguing that in every motion actuality and potentiality are mixed or blended.

St. Thomas’ interpretation of Aristotle's definition of motion, however, is not free of difficulties. His interpretation seems to trivialize the meaning of entelechia. One implication of this interpretation is that whatever happens to be the case right now is an entelechia, as though something which is intrinsically unstable as the instantaneous position of an arrow in flight deserved to be described by the word which Aristotle everywhere else reserves for complex organized states which persist, which hold out in being against internal and external causes tending to destroy them.

In the Metaphysics, however, Aristotle draws a distinction between two kinds of potentiality. On the one hand, there are latent or inactive potentialities. On the other hand, there are active or at-work potentialities. Accordingly, every motion is a complex whole, an enduring unity which organizes distinct parts. Things have being to the extent that they are or are part of determinate wholes, so that to be means to be something, and change has being because it always is or is part of some determinate potentiality, at work and manifest in the world as change.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Energeia and Entelechia
  3. The Standard Account of Aristotle's View of Motion
  4. Thomas' Account of Aristotle's View of Motion
  5. The Limits of Thomas' Account
  6. Facing the Contradictions of Aristotle's Account of Motion
  7. What Motion Is
  8. Zeno's Paradoxes and Aristotle's Definition of Motion
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Aristotle defines motion, by which he means change of any kind, as the actuality of a potentiality as such (or as movable, or as a potentiality -- Physics 201a 10-11, 27-29, b 4-5). The definition is a conjunction of two terms which normally contradict each other, along with, in Greek, a qualifying clause which seems to make the contradiction inescapable. Yet St. Thomas Aquinas called it the only possible way to define motion by what is prior to and better known than motion. At the opposite extreme is the young Descartes, who in the first book he wrote announced that while everyone knows what motion is, no one understands Aristotle's definition of it. According to Descartes, "motion . . . is nothing more than the action by which any body passes from one place to another" (Principles II, 24). The use of the word "passes" makes this definition an obvious circle; Descartes might just as well have called motion the action by which a thing moves. But the important part of Descartes' definition is the words "nothing more than," by which he asserts that motion is susceptible of no definition which is not circular, as one might say "the color red is just the color red," to mean that the term is not reducible to some modification of a wave, or analyzable in any other way. There must be ultimate terms of discourse, or there would be no definitions, and indeed no thought. The point is not that one cannot construct a non-circular definition of such a term, one claimed to be properly irreducible, but that one ought not to do so. The true atoms of discourse are those things which can be explained only by means of things less known than themselves. If motion is such an ultimate term, then to define it by means of anything but synonyms is willfully to choose to dwell in a realm of darkness, at the sacrifice of the understanding which is naturally ours in the form of "good sense" or ordinary common sense.

Descartes' treatment of motion is explicitly anti-Aristotelian and his definition of motion is deliberately circular. The Cartesian physics is rooted in a disagreement with Aristotle about what the best-known things are, and about where thought should take its beginnings. There is, however, a long tradition of interpretation and translation of Aristotle's definition of motion, beginning at least five hundred years before Descartes and dominating discussions of Aristotle today, which seeks to have things both ways. An unusually clear instance of this attitude is found in the following sentence from a medieval Arabic commentary: "Motion is a first entelechy of that which is in potentiality, insofar as it is in potentiality, and if you prefer you may say that it is a transition from potentiality to actuality." You will recognize the first of these two statements presented as equivalent as a translation of Aristotle's definition, and the second as a circular definition of the same type as that of Descartes. Motion is an entelechy; motion is a transition. The strangeness of the word "entelechy" masks the contradiction between these two claims. We must achieve an understanding of Aristotle's word entelechia, the heart of his definition of motion, in order to see that what it says cannot be said just as well by such a word as "transition."

2. Energeia and Entelechia

The word entelecheia was invented by Aristotle, but never defined by him. It is at the heart not only of his definition of motion, but of all his thought. Its meaning is the most knowable in itself of all possible objects of the intellect. There is no starting point from which we can descend to put together the cements of its meaning. We can come to an understanding of entelecheia only by an ascent from what is intrinsically less knowable than it, indeed knowable only through it, but more known because more familiar to us. We have a number of resources by which to begin such an ascent, drawing upon the linguistic elements out of which Aristotle constructed the word, and upon the fact that he uses the wordenergeia as a synonym, or all but a synonym, for entelecheia.

The root of energeia is ergonó deed, work, or actó from which comes the adjective energon used in ordinary speech to mean active, busy, or at work. Energeia is formed by the addition of a noun ending to the adjective energon; we might construct the word is-at-work-ness from Anglo-Saxon roots to translateenergeia into English, or use the more euphonious periphrastic expression, being-at-work. If we are careful to remember how we got there, we could alternatively use Latin roots to make the word "actuality" to translate energeia. The problem with this alternative is that the word "actuality" already belongs to the English language, and has a life of its own which seems to be at variance with the simple sense of being active. By the actuality of a thing, we mean not its being-in-action but its being what it is. For example, there is a fish with an effective means of camouflage: it looks like a rock but it is actually a fish. When an actuality is attributed to that fish, completely at rest at the bottom of the ocean, we don't seem to be talking about any activity. But according to Aristotle, to be something always means to be at work in a certain way. In the case of the fish at rest, its actuality is the activity of metabolism, the work by which it is constantly transforming material from its environment into parts of itself and losing material from itself into its environment, the activity by which the fish maintains itself as a fish and as just the fish it is, and which ceases only when the fish ceases to be. Any static state which has any determinate character can only exist as the outcome of a continuous expenditure of effort, maintaining the state as it is. Thus even the rock, at rest next to the fish, is in activity: to be a rock is to strain to be at the center of the universe, and thus to be in motion unless constrained otherwise, as the rock in our example is constrained by the large quantity of earth already gathered around the center of the universe. A rock at rest at the center is at work maintaining its place, against the counter-tendency of all the earth to displace it. The center of the universe is determined only by the common innate activity of rocks and other kinds of earth. Nothing is which is not somehow in action, maintaining itself either as the whole it is, or as a part of some whole. A rock is inorganic only when regarded in isolation from the universe as a whole which is an organized whole just as blood considered by itself could not be called alive yet is only blood insofar as it contributes to the maintenance of some organized body. No existing rock can fail to contribute to the hierarchical organization of the universe; we can therefore call any existing rock an actual rock.

Energeia, then, always means the being-at-work of some definite, specific something; the rock cannot undergo metabolism, and once the fish does no more than fall to earth and remain there it is no longer a fish. The material and organization of a thing determine a specific capacity or potentiality for activity with respect to which the corresponding activity has the character of an end (telos). Aristotle says "the act is an end and the being-at-work is the act and since energeia is named from the ergon it also extends to the being-at-an-end (entelecheia)" (Metaphysics 1050a 21-23). The word entelecheia has a structure parallel to that of energeia. From the root word telos, meaning end, comes the adjective enteles, used in ordinary speech to mean complete, perfect, or full-grown. But while energeia, being-at-work, is made from the adjective meaning at work and a noun ending, entelecheia is made from the adjective meaning complete and the verb exein. Thus if we translate entelecheia as "completeness" or "perfection," the contribution the meaning of exein makes to the term is not evident. Aristotle probably uses exein for two reasons which lead to the same conclusion: First, one of the common meanings of exein is "to be" in the sense of to remain, to stay, or to keep in some condition specified by a preceding adverb as in the idiomskalos exei, "things are going well," or kakos exei, "things are going badly." It means "to be" in the sense of to continue to be. This is only one of several possible meanings of exein, but there is a second fact which makes it likely that it is the meaning which would strike the ear of a Greek-speaking person of Aristotle's time. There was then in ordinary use the word endelecheia, differing from Aristotle's wordentelecheia only by a delta in place of the tau. Endelecheia means continuity or persistence. As one would expect, there was a good deal of confusion in ancient times between the invented and undefined term entelecheia and the familiar word endelecheia. The use of the pun for the serious philosophic purpose of saying at once two things for whose union the language has no word was a frequent literary device of Aristotle's teacher Plato. In this striking instance, Aristotle seems to have imitated the playful style of his teacher in constructing the most important term in his technical vocabulary. The addition ofexein to enteles, through the joint action of the meaning of the suffix and the sound of the whole, superimposes upon the sense of "completeness" that of continuity. Entelecheia means continuing in a state of completeness, or being at an end which is of such a nature that it is only possible to be there by means of the continual expenditure of the effort required to stay there. Just as energeia extends toentelecheia because it is the activity which makes a thing what it is, entelecheia extends to energeiabecause it is the end or perfection which has being only in, through, and during activity. For the remainder of this entry, the word "actuality" translates both energeia and entelecheia, and "actuality" means just that area of overlap between being-at-work and being-at-an-end which expresses what it means to be something determinate. The words energeia and entelecheia have very different meanings, but function as synonyms because the world is such that things have identities, belong to species, act for ends, and form material into enduring organized wholes. The word actuality as thus used is very close in meaning to the word life, with the exception that it is broader in meaning, carrying no necessary implication of mortality.

Kosman [1969] interprets the definition in substantially the same way as it is interpreted above, utilizing examples of kinds of entelecheia given by Aristotle in On the Soul, and thus he succeeds in bypassing the inadequate translations of the word. The Sachs 1995 translation of Aristotle's Physics translatesentelecheia as being-at-work-staying-itself.

3. The Standard Account of Aristotle's View of Motion

We embarked on this quest for the meaning of entelecheia in order to decide whether the phrase "transition to actuality" could ever properly render it. The answer is now obviously "no." An actuality is something ongoing, but only the ongoing activity of maintaining a state of completeness or perfection already reached; the transition into such a state always lacks and progressively approaches the perfected character which an actuality always has. A dog is not a puppy: the one is, among other things, capable of generating puppies and giving protection, while the other is incapable of generation and in need of protection. We might have trouble deciding exactly when the puppy has ceased to be a puppy and become a dog at the age of one year, for example, it will probably be fully grown and capable of reproducing, but still awkward in its movements and puppyish in its attitudes, but in any respect in which it has become a dog it has ceased to be a puppy.

But our concern was to understand what motion is, and it is obviously the puppy which is in motion, since it is growing toward maturity, while the dog is not in motion in that respect, since its activity has ceased to produce change and become wholly directed toward self-maintenance. If the same thing cannot be in the same respect both an actuality and a transition to actuality, it is clearly the transition that motion is, and the actuality that it isn't. It seems that Descartes is right and Aristotle is wrong. Of course it is possible that Aristotle meant what Descartes said, but simply used the wrong word, that he called motion anentelecheia three times, at the beginning, middle, and end of his explanation of what motion is, when he really meant not entelecheia but the transition or passage to entelecheia. Now, this suggestion would be laughable if it were not what almost everyone who addresses the question today believes. Sir David Ross, certainly the most massively qualified authority on Aristotle of those who have lived in our century and written in our language, the man who supervised the Oxford University Press's forty-five year project of translating all the works of Aristotle into English, in a commentary, on Aristotle's definition of motion, writes: "entelecheia must here mean 'actualization,' not 'actuality'; it is the passage to actuality that iskinesis" (Physics, text with commentary, London, 1936, p. 359). In another book, his commentary on the Metaphysics, Ross makes it clear that he regards the meaning entelecheia has in every use Aristotle makes of it everywhere but in the definition of motion as being not only other than but incompatible with the meaning "actualization." In view of that fact, Ross' decision that "entelecheia must here mean 'actualization'" is a desperate one, indicating a despair of understanding Aristotle out of his own mouth. It is not translation or interpretation but plastic surgery.

Ross' full account of motion as actualization (Aristotle, New York, 1966, pp. 81-82) cites no passages from Aristotle, and no authorities, but patiently explains that motion is motion and cannot, therefore, be an actuality. There are authorities he could have cited, including Moses Maimonides, the twelfth century Jewish philosopher who sought to reconcile Aristotle's philosophy with the Old Testament and Talmud, and who defined motion as "the transition from potentiality to actuality," and the most famous Aristotelian commentator of all time, Averroes, the twelfth century Spanish Muslim thinker, who called motion a passage from non-being to actuality and complete reality. In each case the circular definition is chosen in preference to the one which seems laden with contradictions. A circular statement, to the extent that it is circular, is at least not false, and can as a whole have some content: Descartes' definition amounts to saying "whatever motion is, it is possible only with respect to place," and that of Averroes, Maimonides, and Ross amounts to saying "whatever motion is, it results always in an actuality." An accurate rendering of Aristotle's definition would amount to saying (a) that motion is rest, and (b) that a potentiality, which must be, at a minimum, a privation of actuality, is at the same time that actuality of which it is the lack. There has been one major commentator on Aristotle who was prepared to take seriously and to make sense of both these claims.

4. Thomas' Account of Aristotle's View of Motion

St. Thomas Aquinas, in his interpretation of Aristotle's definition of motion, (Commentary on Aristotle's Physics, London, 1963, pp. 136-137), observes two principles: (1) that Aristotle meant what he wrote, and (2) that what Aristotle wrote is worth the effort of understanding. Writing a century after Maimonides and Averroes, Thomas disposes of their approach to defining motion with few words: it is not Aristotle's definition and it is an error. A passage, a transition, an actualization, an actualizing, or any of the more complex substantives to which translators have resorted which incorporate in some more or less disguised form some progressive sense united to the meaning of actuality, all have in common that they denote a kind of motion. If motion can be defined, then to rest content with explaining motion as a kind of motion is certainly to err; even if one is to reject Aristotle's definition on fundamental philosophical grounds, as Descartes was to do, the first step must be to see what it means. And Thomas explains clearly and simply a sense in which Aristotle's definition is both free of contradiction and genuinely a definition of motion. One must simply see that the growing puppy is a dog, that the half formed lump of bronze on which the sculptor is working is a statue of Hermes, that the tepid water on the fire is hot; what it means to say that the puppy is growing, the bronze is being worked, or the water is being heated, is that each is not just the complex of characteristics it possesses right now; in each case, something that the thing is not yet, already belongs to it as that toward which it is, right now, ordered. To say that something is in motion is just to say that it is both what it is already and something else that it isn't yet. What else do we mean by saying that the puppy is growing, rather than remaining what it is, that the bronze under the sculptor's hand is in a different condition from the identically shaped lump of bronze he has discarded, or that the water is not just tepid but being heated? Motion is the mode in which the future belongs to the present, is the present absence of just those particular absent things which are about to be.

Thomas discusses in detail the example of the water being heated. Assume it to have started cold, and to have been heated so far to room temperature. The heat it now has, which has replaced the potentiality it previously had to be just that hot, belongs to it in actuality. The capacity it has to be still hotter belongs to it in potentiality. To the extent that it is actually hot it has been moved; to the extent that it is not yet as hot as it is going to be, it is not yet moved. The motion is just the joint presence of potentiality and actuality with respect to same thing, in this case heat.

In Thomas' version of Aristotle's definition one can see the alternative to Descartes' approach to physics. Since Descartes regards motion as ultimate and given, his physics will give no account of motion itself, but describe the transient static configurations through which the moving things pass. By Thomas' account, motion is not ultimate but is a consequence of the way in which present states of things are ordered toward other actualities which do not belong to them. One could build on such an account a physics of forces, that is, of those directed potentialities which cause a thing to move, to pass over from the actuality it possesses to another which it lacks but to which it is ordered. Motion will thus not have to be understood as the mysterious departure of things from rest, which alone can be described, but as the outcome of the action upon one another of divergent and conflicting innate tendencies of things. Rest will be the anomaly, since things will be understood as so constituted by nature as to pass over of themselves into certain states of activity, but states of rest will be explainable as dynamic states of balance among things with opposed tendencies. Leibniz, who criticized Descartes' physics and invented a science of dynamics, explicitly acknowledged his debt to Aristotle (see, e.g., Specimen Dynamicum), whose doctrine of entelecheia he regarded himself as restoring in a modified form. From Leibniz we derive our current notions of potential and kinetic energy, whose very names, pointing to the actuality which is potential and the actuality which is motion, preserve the Thomistic resolutions of the two paradoxes in Aristotle's definition of motion.

5. The Limits of Thomas' Account

But though the modern science of dynamics can be seen in germ in St. Thomas' discussion of motion, it can be seen also to reveal difficulties in Thomas' conclusions. According to Thomas, actuality and potentiality do not exclude one another but co-exist as motion. To the extent that an actuality is also a potentiality it is a motion, and to the extent that an actuality is a motion it is a potentiality. The two seeming contradictions cancel each other in the dynamic actuality of the present state which is determined by its own future. But are not potential and kinetic energy two different things? A rock held six feet above the ground has been actually moved identically to the rock thrown six feet above the ground, and at that distance each strains identically to fall to earth; but the one is falling and the other isn't. How can the description which is common to both, when one is moving and the other is at rest, be an account of what motion is? It seems that everything which Thomas says about the tepid water which is being heated can be said also of the tepid water which has been removed from the fire. Each is a coincidence of a certain actuality of heat with a further potentiality to the same heat. What does it mean to say that the water on the fire has, right now, an order to further heat which the water off the fire lacks? If we say that the fire is acting on the one and not on the other in such a way as to disturb its present state, we have begged the question and returned to the position of presupposing motion to explain motion. Thomas' account of Aristotle's definition of motion, though immeasurably superior to that of Sir David Ross as interpretation, and far more sophisticated as an approach to and specification of the conditions an account of motion would have to meet, seems ultimately subject to the same circularity. Maimonides, Averroes, and Ross fail to say how motion differs from rest. Thomas fails to say how any given motion differs from a corresponding state of balanced tension, or of strain and constraint.

The strength of Thomas' interpretation of the definition of motion comes from his taking every word seriously. When Ross discusses Aristotle's definition, he gives no indication of why the he toiouton, or "insofar as it is such," clause should have been included. By Thomas' account, motion is the actuality of any potentiality which is nevertheless still a potentiality. It is the actuality which has not canceled its corresponding potentiality but exists along with it. Motion then is the actuality of any potentiality insofar as it is still a potentiality. This is the formula which applies equally well to the dynamic state of rest and the dynamic state of motion. We shall try to advance our understanding by being still more careful about the meaning of the pronoun he.

Thomas' account of the meaning of Aristotle's definition forces him to construe the grammar of the definition in such a way that the clause introduced by the dative singular feminine relative pronoun he has as its antecedent, in two cases, the neuter participle tou ontos, and in the third, the neuter substantive adjective tou dunatou. It is true that this particular feminine relative pronoun often had an adverbial sense to which its gender was irrelevant, but in the three statements of the definition of motion there is no verb but estin. If the clause is understood adverbially, then, the sentence must mean something like: if motion is a potentiality, it is the actuality of a potentiality. Whatever that might mean, it could at any rate not be a definition of motion. Thus the clause must be understood adjectivally, and Thomas must make the relative pronoun dependent upon a word with which it does not agree in gender. He makes the sentence say that motion is the actuality of the potentiality in which there is yet potentiality. Reading the pronoun as dependent upon the feminine noun entelecheia with which it does agree, we find the sentence saying that motion is the actuality as which it is a potentiality of the potentiality, or the actuality as a potentiality of the potentiality.

6. Facing the Contradictions of Aristotle's Account of Motion

This reading of the definition implies that potentialities exist in two ways, that it is possible to be a potentiality, yet not be an actual potentiality. The beginning of this entry says that Aristotle's definition of motion was made by putting together two terms, actuality and potentiality, which normally contradict each other. Thomas resolved the contradiction by arguing that in every motion actuality and potentiality are mixed or blended, that the condition of becoming-hot of the water is just the simultaneous presence in the same water of some actuality of heat and some remaining potentiality of heat. Earlier it was stated that there was a qualifying clause in Aristotle's definition which seemed to intensify, rather than relieve, the contradiction. This refers to the he toiouton, or he kineton, or he dunaton, which appears in each version of the definition, and which, being grammatically dependent on entelecheia, signifies something the very actuality of which is potentiality. The Thomistic blend of actuality and potentiality has the characteristic that, to the extent that it is actual it is not potential and to the extent that it is potential it is not actual; the hotter the water is, the less is it potentially hot, and the cooler it is, the less is it actually, the more potentially, hot.

The most serious defect in Saint Thomas' interpretation of Aristotle's definition is that, like Ross' interpretation, it broadens, dilutes, cheapens, and trivializes the meaning of the word entelecheia. An immediate implication of the interpretations of both Thomas and Ross is that whatever happens to be the case right now is an entelecheia, as though being at 70 degrees Fahrenheit were an end determined by the nature of water, or as though something which is intrinsically so unstable as the instantaneous position of an arrow in flight deserved to be described by the word which Aristotle everywhere else reserves for complex organized states which persist, which hold out in being against internal and external causes tending to destroy them.

Aristotle's definition of motion applies to any and every motion: the pencil falling to the floor, the white pages in the book turning yellow, the glue in the binding of the book being eaten by insects. Maimonides, Averroes, and Ross, who say that motion is always a transition or passage from potentiality to actuality, must call the being-on-the-floor of the pencil, the being-yellow of the pages, and the crumbled condition of the binding of the book actualities. Thomas, who says that motion is constituted at any moment by the joint presence of actuality and potentiality, is in a still worse position: he must call every position of the pencil on the way to the floor, every color of the pages on the way to being yellow, and every loss of a crumb from the binding an actuality. If these are actualities, then it is no wonder that philosophers such as Descartes rejected Aristotle's account of motion as a useless redundancy, saying no more than that whatever changes, changes into that into which it changes.

We know however that the things Aristotle called actualities are limited in number, and constitute the world in its ordered finitude rather than in its random particularity. The actuality of the adult horse is one, although horses are many and all different from each other. Books and pencils are not actualities at all, even though they are organized wholes, since their organizations are products of human art, and they maintain themselves not as books and pencils but only as earth. Even the organized content of a book, such as that of the first three chapters of Book Three of Aristotle's Physics, does not exist as an actuality, since it is only the new labor of each new reader that gives being to that content, in this case a very difficult labor. By this strict test, the only actualities in the world, that is, the only things which, by their own innate tendencies, maintain themselves in being as organized wholes, seem to be the animals and plants, the ever-the-same orbits of the ever-moving planets, and the universe as a whole. But Aristotle has said that every motion is an entelecheia; if we choose not to trivialize the meaning of entelecheia to make it applicable to motion, we must deepen our understanding of motion to make it applicable to the meaning of entelecheia.

7. What Motion Is

In the Metaphysics, Aristotle argues that if there is a distinction between potentiality and actuality at all, there must be a distinction between two kinds of potentiality. The man with sight, but with his eyes closed, differs from the blind man, although neither is seeing. The first man has the capacity to see, which the second man lacks. There are then potentialities as well as actualities in the world. But when the first man opens his eyes, has he lost the capacity to see? Obviously not; while he is seeing, his capacity to see is no longer merely a potentiality, but is a potentiality which has been put to work. The potentiality to see exists sometimes as active or at-work, and sometimes as inactive or latent. But this example seems to get us no closer to understanding motion, since seeing is just one of those activities which is not a motion. Let us consider, then, a man's capacity to walk across the room. When he is sitting or standing or lying still, his capacity to walk is latent, like the sight of the man with his eyes closed; that capacity nevertheless has real being, distinguishing the man in question from a man who is crippled to the extent of having lost all potentiality to walk. When the man is walking across the room, his capacity to walk has been put to work. But while he is walking, what has happened to his capacity to be at the other side of the room, which was also latent before he began to walk? It too is a potentiality which has been put to work by the act of walking. Once he has reached the other side of the room, his potentiality to be there has been actualized in Ross' sense of the term, but while he is walking, his potentiality to be on the other side of the room is not merely latent, and is not yet canceled by, an actuality in the weak sense, the so-called actuality of being on that other side of the room; while he is walking his potentiality to be on the other side of the room is actual just as a potentiality. The actuality of the potentiality to be on the other side of the room, as just that potentiality, is neither more nor less than the walking across the room.

A similar analysis will apply to any motion whatever. The growth of the puppy is not the actualization of its potentiality to be a dog, but the actuality of that potentiality as a potentiality. The falling of the pencil is the actuality of its potentiality to be on the floor, in actuality as just that: as a potentiality to be on the floor. In each case the motion is just the potentiality qua actual and the actuality qua potential. And the sense we thus give to the word entelecheia is not at odds with its other uses: a motion is like an animal in that it remains completely and exactly what it is through time. My walking across the room is no more a motion as the last step is being taken than at any earlier point. Every motion is a complex whole, an enduring unity which organizes distinct parts, such as the various positions through which the falling pencil passes. As parts of the motion of the pencil, these positions, though distinct, function identically in the ordered continuity determined by the potentiality of the pencil to be on the floor. Things have being to the extent that they are or are part of determinate wholes, so that to be means to be something, and change has being because it always is or is part of some determinate potentiality, at work and manifest in the world as change.

8. Zeno's Paradoxes and Aristotle's Definition of Motion

Consider the application of Aristotle's account of motion to two paradoxes famous in antiquity. Zeno argued in various ways that there is no motion. According to one of his arguments, the arrow in flight is always in some one place, therefore always at rest, and therefore never in motion. We can deduce from Aristotle's definition that Zeno has made the same error, technically called the fallacy of composition, as one who would argue that no animal is alive since its head, when cut off, is not alive, its blood, when drawn out, is not alive, its bones, when removed are not alive, and so on with each part in turn. The second paradox is one attributed to Heraclitus, and taken as proving that there is nothing but motion, that is, no identity, in the world. The saying goes that one cannot step into the same river twice. If the river flows, how can it continue to be itself? But the flux of the river, like the flight of the arrow, is an actuality of just the kind Aristotle formulates in his definition of motion. The river is always the same, as a river, precisely because it is never the same as water. To be a river is to be the always identical actuality of the potentiality of water to be in the sea.

For more discussion of Aristotle's solution to Zeno's paradoxes, see "Zeno: Aristotle's Treatment of Zeno's Paradoxes."

9. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 1999.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2002.
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 2001.
  • Aristotle, Poetics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2006.
  • Aristotle, Physics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Rutgers U. P., 1995.
  • Kosman, L. A. "Aristotle's Definition of Motion," Phronesis, 1969.

Author Information

Joe Sachs
Email: joe.sachs@sjc.edu
St. John's College
U. S. A.




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