Aristotle: Poetics

aristotleThe Poetics of Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) is a much-disdained book. So unpoetic a soul as Aristotle's has no business speaking about such a topic, much less telling poets how to go about their business. He reduces the drama to its language, people say, and the language itself to its least poetic element, the story, and then he encourages insensitive readers like himself to subject stories to crudely moralistic readings, that reduce tragedies to the childish proportions of Aesop-fables. Strangely, though, the Poetics itself is rarely read with the kind of sensitivity its critics claim to possess, and the thing criticized is not the book Aristotle wrote but a caricature of it. Aristotle himself respected Homer so much that he personally corrected a copy of the Iliad for his student Alexander, who carried it all over the world. In his Rhetoric (III, xvi, 9), Aristotle criticizes orators who write exclusively from the intellect, rather than from the heart, in the way Sophocles makes Antigone speak. Aristotle is often thought of as a logician, but he regularly uses the adverb logikôs, logically, as a term of reproach contrasted with phusikôs, naturally or appropriately, to describe arguments made by others, or preliminary and inadequate arguments of his own. Those who take the trouble to look at the Poetics closely will find, I think, a book that treats its topic appropriately and naturally, and contains the reflections of a good reader and characteristically powerful thinker.

Table of Contents

  1. Poetry as Imitation
  2. The Character of Tragedy
  3. Tragic Catharsis
  4. Tragic Pity
  5. Tragic Fear and the Image of Humanity
  6. The Iliad, the Tempest, and Tragic Wonder
  7. Excerpts from Aristotle's Poetics
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Poetry as Imitation

The first scandal in the Poetics is the initial marking out of dramatic poetry as a form of imitation. We call the poet a creator, and are offended at the suggestion that he might be merely some sort of recording device. As the painter's eye teaches us how to look and shows us what we never saw, the dramatist presents things that never existed until he imagined them, and makes us experience worlds we could never have found the way to on our own. But Aristotle has no intention to diminish the poet, and in fact says the same thing I just said, in making the point that poetry is more philosophic than history. By imitation, Aristotle does not mean the sort of mimicry by which Aristophanes, say, finds syllables that approximate the sound of frogs. He is speaking of the imitation of action, and by action he does not mean mere happenings. Aristotle speaks extensively of praxis in the Nicomachean Ethics. It is not a word he uses loosely, and in fact his use of it in the definition of tragedy recalls the discussion in the Ethics.

Action, as Aristotle uses the word, refers only to what is deliberately chosen, and capable of finding completion in the achievement of some purpose. Animals and young children do not act in this sense, and action is not the whole of the life of any of us. The poet must have an eye for the emergence of action in human life, and a sense for the actions that are worth paying attention to. They are not present in the world in such a way that a video camera could detect them. An intelligent, feeling, shaping human soul must find them. By the same token, the action of the drama itself is not on the stage. It takes form and has its being in the imagination of the spectator. The actors speak and move and gesture, but it is the poet who speaks through them, from imagination to imagination, to present to us the thing that he has made. Because that thing he makes has the form of an action, it has to be seen and held together just as actively and attentively by us as by him. The imitation is the thing that is re-produced, in us and for us, by his art. This is a powerful kind of human communication, and the thing imitated is what defines the human realm. If no one had the power to imitate action, life might just wash over us without leaving any trace.

How do I know that Aristotle intends the imitation of action to be understood in this way? In De Anima, he distinguishes three kinds of perception (II, 6; III, 3). There is the perception of proper sensibles-colors, sounds, tastes and so on; these lie on the surfaces of things and can be mimicked directly for sense perception. But there is also perception of common sensibles, available to more than one of our senses, as shape is grasped by both sight and touch, or number by all five senses; these are distinguished by imagination, the power in us that is shared by the five senses, and in which the circular shape, for instance, is not dependent on sight or touch alone. These common sensibles can be mimicked in various ways, as when I draw a messy, meandering ridge of chalk on a blackboard, and your imagination grasps a circle. Finally, there is the perception of that of which the sensible qualities are attributes, the thing--the son of Diares, for example; it is this that we ordinarily mean by perception, and while its object always has an image in the imagination, it can only be distinguished by intellect, no°s (III,4). Skilled mimics can imitate people we know, by voice, gesture, and so on, and here already we must engage intelligence and imagination together. The dramatist imitates things more remote from the eye and ear than familiar people. Sophocles and Shakespeare, for example, imitate repentance and forgiveness, true instances of action in Aristotle's sense of the word, and we need all the human powers to recognize what these poets put before us. So the mere phrase imitation of an action is packed with meaning, available to us as soon as we ask what an action is, and how the image of such a thing might be perceived.

Aristotle does understand tragedy as a development out of the child's mimicry of animal noises, but that is in the same way that he understands philosophy as a development out of our enjoyment of sight-seeing (Metaphysics I, 1). In each of these developments there is a vast array of possible intermediate stages, but just as philosophy is the ultimate form of the innate desire to know, tragedy is considered by Aristotle the ultimate form of our innate delight in imitation. His beloved Homer saw and achieved the most important possibilities of the imitation of human action, but it was the tragedians who, refined and intensified the form of that imitation, and discovered its perfection.

2. The Character of Tragedy

A work is a tragedy, Aristotle tells us, only if it arouses pity and fear. Why does he single out these two passions? Some interpreters think he means them only as examples--pity and fear and other passions like that--but I am not among those loose constructionists. Aristotle does use a word that means passions of that sort (toiouta), but I think he does so only to indicate that pity and fear are not themselves things subject to identification with pin-point precision, but that each refers to a range of feeling. It is just the feelings in those two ranges, however, that belong to tragedy. Why? Why shouldn't some tragedy arouse pity and joy, say, and another fear and cruelty? In various places, Aristotle says that it is the mark of an educated person to know what needs explanation and what doesn't. He does not try to prove that there is such a thing as nature, or such a thing as motion, though some people deny both. Likewise, he understands the recognition of a special and powerful form of drama built around pity and fear as the beginning of an inquiry, and spends not one word justifying that restriction. We, however, can see better why he starts there by trying out a few simple alternatives.

Suppose a drama aroused pity in a powerful way, but aroused no fear at all. This is an easily recognizable dramatic form, called a tear-jerker. The name is meant to disparage this sort of drama, but why? Imagine a well written, well made play or movie that depicts the losing struggle of a likable central character. We are moved to have a good cry, and are afforded either the relief of a happy ending, or the realistic desolation of a sad one. In the one case the tension built up along the way is released within the experience of the work itself; in the other it passes off as we leave the theater, and readjust our feelings to the fact that it was, after all, only make-believe. What is wrong with that? There is always pleasure in strong emotion, and the theater is a harmless place to indulge it. We may even come out feeling good about being so compassionate. But Dostoyevski depicts a character who loves to cry in the theater, not noticing that while she wallows in her warm feelings her coach-driver is shivering outside. She has day-dreams about relieving suffering humanity, but does nothing to put that vague desire to work. If she is typical, then the tear-jerker is a dishonest form of drama, not even a harmless diversion but an encouragement to lie to oneself.

Well then, let's consider the opposite experiment, in which a drama arouses fear in a powerful way, but arouses little or no pity. This is again a readily recognizable dramatic form, called the horror story, or in a recent fashion, the mad-slasher movie. The thrill of fear is the primary object of such amusements, and the story alternates between the build-up of apprehension and the shock of violence. Again, as with the tear-jerker, it doesn't much matter whether it ends happily or with uneasiness, or even with one last shock, so indeterminate is its form. And while the tearjerker gives us an illusion of compassionate delicacy, the unrestrained shock-drama obviously has the effect of coarsening feeling. Genuine human pity could not co-exist with the so-called graphic effects these films use to keep scaring us. The attraction of this kind of amusement is again the thrill of strong feeling, and again the price of indulging the desire for that thrill may be high.

Let us consider a milder form of the drama built on arousing fear. There are stories in which fearsome things are threatened or done by characters who are in the end defeated by means similar to, or in some way equivalent to, what they dealt out. The fear is relieved in vengeance, and we feel a satisfaction that we might be inclined to call justice. To work on the level of feeling, though, justice must be understood as the exact inverse of the crime--doing to the offender the sort of thing he did or meant to do to others. The imagination of evil then becomes the measure of good, or at least of the restoration of order. The satisfaction we feel in the vicarious infliction of pain or death is nothing but a thin veil over the very feelings we mean to be punishing. This is a successful dramatic formula, arousing in us destructive desires that are fun to feel, along with the self-righteous illusion that we are really superior to the character who displays them. The playwright who makes us feel that way will probably be popular, but he is a menace.

We have looked at three kinds of non-tragedy that arouse passions in a destructive way, and we could add others. There are potentially as many kinds as there are passions and combinations of passions. That suggests that the theater is just an arena for the manipulation of passions in ways that are pleasant in the short run and at least reckless to pursue repeatedly. At worst, the drama could be seen as dealing in a kind of addiction, which it both produces and holds the only remedy for. But we have not yet tried to talk about the combination of passions characteristic of tragedy.

When we turn from the sort of examples I have given, to the acknowledged examples of tragedy, we find ourselves in a different world. The tragedians I have in mind are five: Aeschylus, Sophocles, and Euripides; Shakespeare, who differs from them only in time; and Homer, who differs from them somewhat more, in the form in which he composed, but shares with them the things that matter most. I could add other authors, such as Dostoyevski, who wrote stories of the tragic kind in much looser literary forms, but I want to keep the focus on a small number of clear paradigms.

When we look at a tragedy we find the chorus in Antigone telling us what a strange thing a human being is, that passes beyond all boundaries (lines 332 ff.), or King Lear asking if man is no more than this, a poor, bare, forked animal (III, iv, 97ff.), or Macbeth protesting to his wife "I dare do all that may become a man; who dares do more is none" (I, vii, 47-8), or Oedipus taunting Teiresias with the fact that divine art was of no use against the Sphinx, but only Oedipus' own human ingenuity (Oed. Tyr. 39098), or Agamemnon, resisting walking home on tapestries, saying to his wife "I tell you to revere me as a man, not a god" (925), or Cadmus in the Bacchae saying "I am a man, nothing more" (199), while Dionysus tells Pentheus "You do not know what you are" (506), or Patroclus telling Achilles "Peleus was not your father nor Thetis your mother, but the gray sea bore you, and the towering rocks, so hard is your heart" (Iliad XVI, 335 ). I could add more examples of this kind by the dozen, and your memories will supply others. Tragedy seems always to involve testing or finding the limits of what is human. This is no mere orgy of strong feeling, but a highly focussed way of bringing our powers to bear on the image of what is human as such. I suggest that Aristotle is right in saying that the powers which first of all bring this human image to sight for us are pity and fear.

It is obvious that the authors in our examples are not just putting things in front of us to make us cry or shiver or gasp. The feelings they arouse are subordinated to another effect. Aristotle begins by saying that tragedy arouses pity and fear in such a way as to culminate in a cleansing of those passions, the famous catharsis. The word is used by Aristotle only the once, in his preliminary definition of tragedy. I think this is because its role is taken over later in the Poetics by another, more positive, word, but the idea of catharsis is important in itself, and we should consider what it might mean.

3. Tragic Catharsis

First of all, the tragic catharsis might be a purgation. Fear can obviously be an insidious thing that undermines life and poisons it with anxiety. It would be good to flush this feeling from our systems, bring it into the open, and clear the air. This may explain the appeal of horror movies, that they redirect our fears toward something external, grotesque, and finally ridiculous, in order to puncture them. On the other hand, fear might have a secret allure, so that what we need to purge is the desire for the thrill that comes with fear. The horror movie also provides a safe way to indulge and satisfy the longing to feel afraid, and go home afterward satisfied; the desire is purged, temporarily, by being fed. Our souls are so many-headed that opposite satisfactions may be felt at the same time, but I think these two really are opposite. In the first sense of purgation, the horror movie is a kind of medicine that does its work and leaves the soul healthier, while in the second sense it is a potentially addictive drug. Either explanation may account for the popularity of these movies among teenagers, since fear is so much a fact of that time of life. For those of us who are older, the tear-jerker may have more appeal, offering a way to purge the regrets of our lives in a sentimental outpouring of pity. As with fear, this purgation too may be either medicinal or drug-like.

This idea of purgation, in its various forms, is what we usually mean when we call something cathartic. People speak of watching football, or boxing, as a catharsis of violent urges, or call a shouting match with a friend a useful catharsis of buried resentment. This is a practical purpose that drama may also serve, but it has no particular connection with beauty or truth; to be good in this purgative way, a drama has no need to be good in any other way. No one would be tempted to confuse the feeling at the end of a horror movie with what Aristotle calls "the tragic pleasure," nor to call such a movie a tragedy. But the English word catharsis does not contain everything that is in the Greek word. Let us look at other things it might mean.

Catharsis in Greek can mean purification. While purging something means getting rid of it, purifying something means getting rid of the worse or baser parts of it. It is possible that tragedy purifies the feelings themselves of fear and pity. These arise in us in crude ways, attached to all sorts of objects. Perhaps the poet educates our sensibilities, our powers to feel and be moved, by refining them and attaching them to less easily discernible objects. There is a line in The Wasteland, "I will show you fear in a handful of dust." Alfred Hitchcock once made us all feel a little shudder when we took showers. The poetic imagination is limited only by its skill, and can turn any object into a focus for any feeling. Some people turn to poetry to find delicious and exquisite new ways to feel old feelings, and consider themselves to enter in that way into a purified state. It has been argued that this sort of thing is what tragedy and the tragic pleasure are all about, but it doesn't match up with my experience. Sophocles does make me fear and pity human knowledge when I watch the Oedipus Tyrannus, but this is not a refinement of those feelings but a discovery that they belong to a surprising object. Sophocles is not training my feelings, but using them to show me something worthy of wonder.

The word catharsis drops out of the Poetics because the word wonder, to rhaumaston, replaces it, first in chapter 9, where Aristotle argues that pity and fear arise most of all where wonder does, and finally in chapters 24 and 25, where he singles out wonder as the aim of the poetic art itself, into which the aim of tragedy in particular merges. Ask yourself how you feel at the end of a tragedy. You have witnessed horrible things and felt painful feelings, but the mark of tragedy is that it brings you out the other side. Aristotle's use of the word catharsis is not a technical reference to purgation or purification but a beautiful metaphor for the peculiar tragic pleasure, the feeling of being washed or cleansed.

The tragic pleasure is a paradox. As Aristotle says, in a tragedy, a happy ending doesn't make us happy. At the end of the play the stage is often littered with bodies, and we feel cleansed by it all. Are we like Clytemnestra, who says she rejoiced when spattered by her husband's blood, like the earth in a Spring rain (Ag. 1389-92)? Are we like Iago, who has to see a beautiful life destroyed to feel better about himself (Oth. V, i, 18-20)? We all feel a certain glee in the bringing low of the mighty, but this is in no way similar to the feeling of being washed in wonderment. The closest thing I know to the feeling at the end of a tragedy is the one that comes with the sudden, unexpected appearance of something beautiful. In a famous essay on beauty (Ennead I, tractate 6), Plotinus says two things that seem true to me: "Clearly [beauty] is something detected at a first glance, something that the soul... recognizes, gives welcome to, and, in a way, fuses with" (beginning sec. 2). What is the effect on us of this recognition? Plotinus says that in every instance it is "an astonishment, a delicious wonderment" (end sec. 4). Aristotle is insistent that a tragedy must be whole and one, because only in that way can it be beautiful, while he also ascribes the superiority of tragedy over epic poetry to its greater unity and concentration (ch. 26). Tragedy is not just a dramatic form in which some works are beautiful and others not; tragedy is itself a species of beauty. All tragedies are beautiful.

By following Aristotle's lead, we have now found five marks of tragedy: (1) it imitates an action, (2) it arouses pity and fear, (3) it displays the human image as such, (4) it ends in wonder, and (5) it is inherently beautiful. We noticed earlier that it is action that characterizes the distinctively human realm, and it is reasonable that the depiction of an action might show us a human being in some definitive way, but what do pity and fear have to do with that showing? The answer is everything.

4. Tragic Pity

First, let us consider what tragic pity consists in. The word pity tends to have a bad name these days, and to imply an attitude of condescension that diminishes its object. This is not a matter of the meanings of words, or even of changing attitudes. It belongs to pity itself to be two-sided, since any feeling of empathy can be given a perverse twist by the recognition that it is not oneself but another with whom one is feeling a shared pain. One of the most empathetic characters in all literature is Edgar in King Lear. He describes himself truly as "a most poor man, made tame to fortune's blows, Who, by the art of known and feeling sorrows, Am pregnant to good pity" (IV, vi, 217-19). Two of his lines spoken to his father are powerful evidence of the insight that comes from suffering oneself and taking on the suffering of others: "Thy life's a miracle" (IV, vi, 5 5 ), he says, and "Ripeness is all" (V, ii, 11), trying to help his father see that life is still good and death is not something to be sought. Yet in the last scene of the play this same Edgar voices the stupidest words ever spoken in any tragedy, when he concludes that his father just got what he deserved when he lost his eyes, since he had once committed adultery (V, iii, 171-4). Having witnessed the play, we know that Gloucester lost his eyes because he chose to help Lear, when the kingdom had become so corrupt that his act of kindness appeared as a walking fire in a dark world (I1I, iv, 107). There is a chain of effects from Gloucester's adultery to his mutilation, but it is not a sequence that reveals the true cause of that horror. The wholeness of action that Shakespeare shapes for us shows that Gloucester's goodness, displayed in a courageous, deliberate choice, and not his weakness many years earlier, cost him his eyes. Edgar ends by giving in to the temptation to moralize, to chase after the "fatal flaw" which is no part of tragedy, and loses his capacity to see straight.

This suggests that holding on to proper pity leads to seeing straight, and that seems exactly right. But what is proper pity? There is a way of missing the mark that is opposite to condescension, and that is the excess of pity called sentimentality. There are people who use the word sentimental for any display of feeling, or any taking seriously of feeling, but their attitude is as blind as Edgar's. Sentimentality is inordinate feeling, feeling that goes beyond the source that gives rise to it. The woman in Dostoyevski's novel who loves pitying for its own sake is an example of this vice. But between Edgar's moralizing and her gushing there is a range of appropriate pity. Pity is one of the instruments by which a poet can show us what we are. We pity the loss of Gloucester's eyes because we know the value of eyes, but more deeply, we pity the violation of Gloucester's decency, and in so doing we feel the truth that without such decency, and without respect for it, there is no human life. Shakespeare is in control here, and the feeling he produces does not give way in embarrassment to moral judgment, nor does it make us wallow mindlessly in pity because it feels so good; the pity he arouses in us shows us what is precious in us, in the act of its being violated in another.

5. Tragic Fear and the Image of Humanity

Since every boundary has two sides, the human image is delineated also from the outside, the side of the things that threaten it. This is shown to us through the feeling of fear. As Aristotle says twice in the Rhetoric, what we pity in others, we fear for ourselves (1382b 26, 1386a 27). In our mounting fear that Oedipus will come to know the truth about himself, we feel that something of our own is threatened. Tragic fear, exactly like tragic pity, and either preceding it or simultaneous with it, shows us what we are and are unwilling to lose. It makes no sense to say that Oedipus' passion for truth is a flaw, since that is the very quality that makes us afraid on his behalf. Tragedy is never about flaws, and it is only the silliest of mistranslations that puts that claim in Aristotle's mouth. Tragedy is about central and indispensable human attributes, disclosed to us by the pity that draws us toward them and the fear that makes us recoil from what threatens them.

Because the suffering of the tragic figure displays the boundaries of what is human, every tragedy carries the sense of universality. Oedipus or Antigone or Lear or Othello is somehow every one of us, only more so. But the mere mention of these names makes it obvious that they are not generalized characters, but altogether particular. And if we did not feel that they were genuine individuals, they would have no power to engage our emotions. It is by their particularity that they make their marks on us, as though we had encountered them in the flesh. It is only through the particularity of our feelings that our bonds with them emerge. What we care for and cherish makes us pity them and fear for them, and thereby the reverse also happens: our feelings of pity and fear make us recognize what we care for and cherish. When the tragic figure is destroyed it is a piece of ourselves that is lost. Yet we never feel desolation at the end of a tragedy, because what is lost is also, by the very same means, found. I am not trying to make a paradox, but to describe a marvel. It is not so strange that we learn the worth of something by losing it; what is astonishing is what the tragedians are able to achieve by making use of that common experience. They lift it up into a state of wonder.

Within our small group of exemplary poetic works, there are two that do not have the tragic form, and hence do not concentrate all their power into putting us in a state of wonder, but also depict the state of wonder among their characters and contain speeches that reflect on it. They are Homer's Iliad and Shakespeare's Tempest. (Incidentally, there is an excellent small book called Woe or Wonder, the Emotional Effect of Shakespearean Tragedy, by J. V. Cunningham, that demonstrates the continuity of the traditional understanding of tragedy from Aristotle to Shakespeare.) The first poem in our literary heritage, and Shakespeare's last play, both belong to a conversation of which Aristotle's Poetics is the most prominent part.

6. The Iliad, the Tempest, and Tragic Wonder

In both the Iliad and the Tempest there are characters with arts that in some ways resemble that of the poet. It is much noticed that Prospero's farewell to his art coincides with Shakespeare's own, but it may be less obvious that Homer has put into the Iliad a partial representation of himself. But the last 150 lines of Book XVIII of the Iliad describe the making of a work of art by Hephaestus. I will not consider here what is depicted on the shield of Achilles, but only the meaning in the poem of the shield itself. In Book XVIII, Achilles has realized what mattered most to him when it is too late. The Greeks are driven back to their ships, as Achilles had prayed they would be, and know that they are lost without him. "But what pleasure is this to me now," he says to his mother, "when my beloved friend is dead, Patroclus, whom I cherished beyond all friends, as the equal of my own soul; I am bereft of him" (80-82). Those last words also mean "I have killed him." In his desolation, Achilles has at last chosen to act. "I will accept my doom," he says (115 ). Thetis goes to Hephaestus because, in spite of his resolve, Achilles has no armor in which to meet his fate. She tells her son's story, concluding "he is lying on the ground, anguishing at heart" (461). Her last word, anguishing, acheuôn, is built on Achilles' name.

Now listen to what Hephaestus says in reply: "Take courage, and do not let these things distress you in your heart. Would that I had the power to hide him far away from death and the sounds of grief when grim fate comes to him, but I can see that beautiful armor surrounds him, of such a kind that many people, one after another, who look on it, will wonder" (463-67). Is it not evident that this source of wonder that surrounds Achilles, that takes the sting from his death even in a mother's heart, is the Iliad itself? But how does the Iliad accomplish this?

Let us shift our attention for a moment to the Tempest. The character Alonso, in the power of the magician Prospero, spends the length of the play in the illusion that his son has drowned. To have him alive again, Alonso says, "I wish Myself were mudded in that oozy bed Where my son lies" (V, i, 150-2). But he has already been there for three hours in his imagination; he says earlier "my son i' th' ooze is bedded; and I'll seek him deeper than e'er plummet sounded And with him there lie mudded" (III, iii, 100-2). What is this muddy ooze? It is Alonso's grief, and his regret for exposing his son to danger, and his self-reproach for his own past crime against Prospero and Prospero's baby daughter, which made his son a just target for divine retribution; the ooze is Alonso's repentance, which feels futile to him since it only comes after he has lost the thing he cares most about. But the spirit Ariel sings a song to Alonso's son: "Full fathom five thy father lies; Of his bones are coral made; Those are pearls that were his eyes; Nothing of him that doth fade But doth suffer a sea change Into something rich and strange" (I, ii, 397-402). Alonso's grief is aroused by an illusion, an imitation of an action, but his repentance is real, and is slowly transforming him into a different man. Who is this new man? Let us take counsel from the "honest old councilor" Gonzalo, who always has the clearest sight in the play. He tells us that on this voyage, when so much seemed lost, every traveller found himself "When no man was his own" (V, i, 206-13). The something rich and strange into which Alonso changes is himself, as he was before his life took a wrong turn. Prospero's magic does no more than arrest people in a potent illusion; in his power they are "knit up In their distractions" (III, iii, 89-90). When released, he says, "they shall be themselves" (V, i, 32).

On virtually every page of the Tempest, the word wonder appears, or else some synonym for it. Miranda's name is Latin for wonder, her favorite adjective brave seems to mean both good and out-of-the-ordinary, and the combination rich and strange means the same. What is wonder? J. V. Cunningham describes it in the book I mentioned as the shocked limit of all feeling, in which fear, sorrow, and joy can all merge. There is some truth in that, but it misses what is wonderful or wondrous about wonder. It suggests that in wonder our feelings are numbed and we are left limp, wrung dry of all emotion. But wonder is itself a feeling, the one to which Miranda is always giving voice, the powerful sense that what is before one is both strange and good. Wonder does not numb the other feelings; what it does is dislodge them from their habitual moorings. The experience of wonder is the disclosure of a sight or thought or image that fits no habitual context of feeling or understanding, but grabs and holds us by a power borrowed from nothing apart from itself. The two things that Plotinus says characterize beauty, that the soul recognizes it at first glance and spontaneously gives welcome to it, equally describe the experience of wonder. The beautiful always produces wonder, if it is seen as beautiful, and the sense of wonder always sees beauty.

But are there really no wonders that are ugly? The monstrosities that used to be exhibited in circus side-shows are wonders too, are they not? In the Tempest, three characters think first of all of such spectacles when they lay eyes on Caliban (II, ii, 28-31; V, i, 263-6), but they are incapable of wonder, since they think they know everything that matters already. A fourth character in the same batch, who is drunk but not insensible, gives way at the end of Act II to the sense that this is not just someone strange and deformed, nor just a useful servant, but a brave monster. But Stephano is not like the holiday fools who pay to see monstrosities like two-headed calves or exotic sights like wild men of Borneo. I recall an aquarium somewhere in Europe that had on display an astoundingly ugly catfish. People came casually up to its tank, were startled, made noises of disgust, and turned away. Even to be arrested before such a sight feels in some way perverse and has some conflict in the feeling it arouses, as when we stare at the victims of a car wreck. The sight of the ugly or disgusting, when it is felt as such, does not have the settled repose or willing surrender that are characteristic of wonder. "Wonder is sweet," as Aristotle says.

This sweet contemplation of something outside us is exactly opposite to Alonso's painful immersion in his own remorse, but in every other respect he is a model of the spectator of a tragedy. We are in the power of another for awhile, the sight of an illusion works real and durable changes in us, we merge into something rich and strange, and what we find by being absorbed in the image of another is ourselves. As Alonso is shown a mirror of his soul by Prospero, we are shown a mirror of ourselves in Alonso, but in that mirror we see ourselves as we are not in witnessing the Tempest, but in witnessing .a tragedy. The Tempest is a beautiful play, suffused with wonder as well as with reflections on wonder, but it holds the intensity of the tragic experience at a distance. Homer, on the other hand, has pulled off a feat even more astounding than Shakespeare's, by imitating the experience of a spectator of tragedy within a story that itself works on us as a tragedy.

In Book XXIV of the Iliad, forms of the word tham bos, amazement, occur three times in three lines (482-4), when Priam suddenly appears in the hut of Achilles and "kisses the terrible man-slaughtering hands that killed his many sons" (478-9), but this is only the prelude to the true wonder. Achilles and Priam cry together, each for his own grief, as each has cried so often before, but this time a miracle happens. Achilles' grief is transformed into satisfaction, and cleansed from his chest and his hands (513-14). This is all the more remarkable, since Achilles has for days been repeatedly trying to take out his raging grief on Hector's dead body. The famous first word of the Iliad, mÍnis, wrath, has come back at the beginning of Book XXIV in the participle meneainôn (22), a constant condition that Lattimore translates well as "standing fury." But all this hardened rage evaporates in one lamentation, just because Achilles shares it with his enemy's father. Hermes had told Priam to appeal to Achilles in the names of his father, his mother, and his child, "in order to stir his heart" (466-7), but Priam's focussed misery goes straight to Achilles' heart without diluting the effect. The first words out of Priam's mouth are "remember your father" (486). Your father deserves pity, Priam says, so "pity me with him in mind, since I am more pitiful even than he; I have dared what no other mortal on earth ever dared, to stretch out my lips to the hand of the man who murdered my children" (503-4).

Achilles had been pitying Patroclus, but mainly himself, but the feeling to which Priam has directed him now is exactly the same as tragic pity. Achilles is looking at a human being who has chosen to go to the limits of what is humanly possible to search for something that matters to him. The wonder of this sight takes Achilles out of his self-pity, but back into himself as a son and as a sharer of human misery itself. All his old longings for glory and revenge fall away, since they have no place in the sight in which he is now absorbed. For the moment, the beauty of Priam's terrible action re-makes the world, and determines what matters and what doesn't. The feeling in this moment out of time is fragile, and Achilles feels it threatened by tragic fear. In the strange fusion of this scene, what Achilles fears is himself; "don't irritate me any longer now, old man," he says when Priam tries to hurry along the return of Hector's body, "don't stir up my heart in its griefs any more now, lest I not spare even you yourself' (560, 568-9). Finally, after they share a meal, they just look at each other. "Priam wondered at Achilles, at how big he was and what he was like, for he seemed equal to the gods, but Achilles wondered at Trojan Priam, looking on the worthy sight of him and hearing his story" (629-32). In the grip of wonder they do not see enemies. They see truly. They see the beauty in two men who have lost almost everything. They see a son a father should be proud of and a father a son should revere.

The action of the Iliad stretches from Achilles' deliberate choice to remove himself from the war to his deliberate choice to return Hector's body to Priam. The passion of the Iliad moves from anger through pity and fear to wonder. Priam's wonder lifts him for a moment out of the misery he is enduring, and permits him to see the cause of that misery as still something good. Achilles' wonder is similar to that of Priam, since Achilles too sees the cause of his anguish in a new light, but in his case this takes several steps. When Priam first appears in his hut, Homer compares the amazement this produces to that with which people look at a murderer who has fled from his homeland (480-84). This is a strange comparison, and it recalls the even stranger fact disclosed one book earlier that Patroclus, whom everyone speaks of as gentle and kind-hearted (esp. XVII, 670-71), who gives his life because he cannot bear to see his friends destroyed to satisfy Achilles' anger, this same Patroclus began his life as a murderer in his own country, and came to Achilles' father Peleus for a second chance at life. When Achilles remembers his father, he is remembering the man whose kindness brought Patroclus into his life, so that his tears, now for his father, now again for Patroclus (XXIV, 511-12), merge into a single grief. But the old man crying with him is a father too, and Achilles' tears encompass Priam along with Achilles' own loved ones. Finally, since Priam is crying for Hector, Achilles' grief includes Hector himself, and so it turns his earlier anguish inside out. If Priam is like Achilles' father, then Hector must come to seem to Achilles to be like a brother, or to be like himself.

Achilles cannot be brought to such a reflection by reasoning, nor do the feelings in which he has been embroiled take him in that direction. Only Priam succeeds in unlocking Achilles' heart, and he does so by an action, by kissing his hand. From the beginning of Book XVIII (23, 27, 33), Achilles' hands are referred to over and over and over, as he uses them to pour dirt on his head, to tear his hair, and to kill every Trojan he can get his hands on. Hector, who must go up against those hands, is mesmerized by them; they are like a fire, he says, and repeats it. "His hands seem like a fire" (XX, 371-2). After Priam kisses Achilles' hand, and after they cry together, Homer tells us that the desire for lamentation went out of Achilles' chest and out of his hands (XXIV, 514). His murderous, manslaughtering hands are stilled by a grief that finally has no enemy to take itself out on. When, in Book XVIII, Achilles had accepted his doom (115), it was part of a bargain; "I will lie still when I am dead," he had said, "but now I must win splendid glory" (121). But at the end of the poem, Achilles has lost interest in glory. He is no longer eaten up by the desire to be lifted above Hector and Priam, but comes to rest in just looking at them for what they are. Homer does surround Achilles in armor that takes the sting from his misery and from his approaching death, by working that misery and death into the wholeness of the Iliad. But the Iliad is, as Aristotle says, the prototype of tragedy; it is not a poem that aims at conferring glory but a poem that bestows the gift of wonder.

Like Alonso in the Tempest, Achilles ultimately finds himself. Of the two, Achilles is the closer model of the spectator of a tragedy, because Alonso plunges deep into remorse before he is brought back into the shared world. Achilles is lifted directly out of himself, into the shared world, in the act of wonder, and sees his own image in the sorrowing father in front of him. This is exactly what a tragedy does to us, and exactly what we experience in looking at Achilles. In his loss, we pity him. In his fear of himself, on Priam's behalf, we fear for him, that he might lose his new-won humanity. In his capacity to be moved by the wonder of a suffering fellow human, we wonder at him. At the end of the Iliad, as at the end of every tragedy, we are washed in the beauty of the human image, which our pity and our fear have brought to sight. The five marks of tragedy that we learned of from Aristotle's Poetics--that it imitates an action, arouses pity and fear, displays the human image as such, ends in wonder, and is inherently beautiful--give a true and powerful account of the tragic pleasure.

7. Excerpts from Aristotle's Poetics

Ch. 6 A tragedy is an imitation of an action that is serious and has a wholeness in its extent, in language that is pleasing (though in distinct ways in its different parts), enacted rather than narrated, culminating, by means of pity and fear, in the cleansing of these passions ...So tragedy is an imitation not of people, but of action, life, and happiness or unhappiness, while happiness and unhappiness have their being in activity, and come to completion not in a quality but in some sort of action ...Therefore it is deeds and the story that are the end at which tragedy aims, and in all things the end is what matters most ...So the source that governs tragedy in the way that the soul governs life is the story.

Ch. 7 An extended whole is that which has a beginning, middle and end. But a beginning is something which, in itself, does not need to be after anything else, while something else naturally is the case or comes about after it; and an end is its contrary, something which in itself is of such a nature as to be after something else, either necessarily or for the most part, but to have nothing else after it-It is therefore needful that wellput-together stories not begin from just anywhere at random, nor end just anywhere at random ...And beauty resides in size and order ...the oneness and wholeness of the beautiful thing being present all at once in contemplation ...in stories, just as in human organizations and in living things.

Ch. 8 A story is not one, as some people think, just because it is about one person ...And Homer, just as he is distinguished in all other ways, seems to have seen this point beautifully, whether by art or by nature.

Ch. 9 Now tragedy is an imitation not only of a complete action, but also of objects of fear and pity, and these arise most of all when events happen contrary to expectation but in consequence of one another; for in this way they will have more wonder in them than if they happened by chance or by fortune, since even among things that happen by chance, the greatest sense of wonder is from those that seem to have happened by design.

Chs. 13-14 Since it is peculiar to tragedy to be an imitation of actions arousing pity and fear ...and since the former concerns someone who is undeserving of suffering and the latter concerns someone like us ...the story that works well must ...depict a change from good to bad fortune, resulting not from badness one that arises from the actions themselves, the astonishment coming about through things that are likely, as in the Oedipus of Sophocles. A revelation, as the word indicates, is a change from ignorance to knowledge, that produces either friendship or hatred in people marked out for good or bad fortune. The most beautiful of revelations occurs when reversals of condition come about at the same time, as is the case in the Oedipus.--Ch. 11

Chs. 24-5 Wonder needs to be produced in tragedies, but in the epic there is more room for that which confounds reason, by means of which wonder comes about most of all, since in the epic one does not see the person who performs the action; the events surrounding the pursuit of Hector would seem ridiculous if they were on stage ...But wonder is sweet ...And Homer most of all has taught the rest of us how one ought to speak of what is untrue ...One ought to choose likely impossibilities in preference to unconvincing possibilities ...And if a poet has, represented impossible things, then he has missed the mark, but that is the right thing to do if he thereby hits the mark that is the end of the poetic art itself, that is, if in that way he makes that or some other part more wondrous.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 1999.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2002.
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 2001.
  • Aristotle, Poetics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2006.
  • Aristotle, Physics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Rutgers U. P., 1995.

Author Information

Joe Sachs
Email: joe.sachs@sjc.edu
St. John's College
U. S. A.