Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Angélique Arnauld (1591-1661)

The reforming abbess of the convent of Port-Royal, Mère Angélique Arnauld developed an Augustinian philosophy deeply influenced by the Jansenist movement.  Her philosophy of God follows the via negativa in its stress on God’s incomprehensibility.  Her theory of moral virtue is emphatically theocentric; even such natural virtues as patience are presented as emanations of grace.   The monastic virtues of poverty and humility receive pride of place in this account.  Reflecting her struggle with political and ecclesiastical authorities, Arnauld’s philosophy stresses the rights of women to education, to theological culture, to self-government, and to fidelity to personal conscience.  Although she affirms the existence of free will, Arnauld’s emphasis on the depth of human depravity and the dependence of the moral agent on divine grace for the execution of virtuous action bears the traces of theological determinism.  Long considered a minor voice in the Jansenist strand of Augustinian philosophy developed by Antoine Arnauld and Blaise Pascal, Angélique Arnauld’s original variations on Augustinianism have recently been underscored by feminist commentators.  The abbess’s gendered account of virtue is drawn from the experience of nuns committed to a strict contemplative life. Her defense of the rights of women to theological culture and opinion challenged the patriarchal commands issued by throne and altar that recommended religious silence for nuns.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Apophatic Theology
    2. Virtue Theory
    3. Theological Determinism
    4. Gender and Right
  4. Interpretation and Relevance
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on September 8, 1591, Jacqueline Marie Arnauld belonged to a prominent noblesse de robe family.  Both her father Antoine Arnauld and her mother Catherine Marion Arnauld descended from families renowned for their lawyers, parliamentarians, and diplomats.  Her grandfather Antoine Arnauld the Elder had battled the Jesuits in the parlement of Paris.  The family’s juridical culture and hostility to the Jesuits would durably mark the younger generation during the battle over Jansenism.

From her infancy, Jacqueline Marie Arnauld had been designated by the family as a future nun and superior.  In 1599 her maternal grandfather Simon Marion successfully obtained from King Henri IV the royal appointment of his niece as the abbess of Port-Royal, a Cistercian convent in the southwestern hinterlands of Paris. The family falsified the age of the abbatial nominee in documents sent to the Vatican in order to circumvent the requirements of canon law.  To receive the rudiments of religious education, Jacqueline Marie was sent to the decadent convent of Maubuisson, governed by the sister of the king’s mistress.  Despite the low level of education, the nascent abbess discovered Stoicism through her reading of Plutarch.  Now known by her religious name as Mère Marie-Angélique de Sainte-Magdalene [popularly as Mère Angélique], the young nun was formally installed as coadjutor abbess on April 10, 1602 and upon the death of Abbess Jeanne Boulehart on July 3, 1602, was declared the abbess of Port-Royal.  This childhood experience of forced vocations, trafficking in religious office, and perjury to attain social position would influence the mature Mère Angélique’s campaign to abolish just such abuses in the name of vocational freedom.

The eleven-year old abbess had inherited a lax convent containing scarcely a dozen nuns.  Liturgical offices had languished; sermons were rarely heard; the nuns entertained themselves by leisurely visits with the neighbors, masked balls, and elaborate decoration of their private apartments.  In 1608, Mère Angélique underwent a sudden conversion.  With the reluctant consent of her subjects, she launched the convent’s reform.  Her reforms included the abolition of private property and the institution of strictly communal property; the restoration of the rule of silence; the restoration of the night office; the institution of a vegetarian diet; the strict practice of cloister, with visitors relegated to a parlor divided by a grille.  The Angelican reform campaign reached a dramatic apogee on September 15, 1609, the journée du guichet, when Mère Angélique refused her own family admission to the convent.

Intellectual as well as moral, the Angelican reform also devoted itself to the development of a theological culture by the nuns.  Distinguished theologians, notably Archange de Pembroke, Benot de Canfield, and François de Sales, preached and lectured at the convent.  The philosophical and theological orientation of these preachers was clearly Augustinian rather than Thomistic.  This new Augustinian intellectual culture was reinforced by readings from Saint Augustine and Saint Bernard of Clairvaux at table and by the neo-Augustinian conferences on the spiritual life delivered by Mère Angélique herself.  During the Oratorian ascendancy (1626-33), when Oratorian priests served as the convent’s chaplains, Port-Royal fell under the influence of the mystical école française.  A disciple of the Pseudo-Dionysius, Pierre Bérulle defended apophatic theology, in which the negative attributes of the godhead are underscored; Charles Condren stressed the annihilation of self which is essential for union with God and authentic knowledge of the divine attributes.  The Oratorian themes of divine incomprehensibility and annihilation of the human subject clearly influenced Mère Angélique’s philosophy.

Under Mère Angélique’s direction, Port-Royal flourished as a model of reformed convent life.  In 1626, the convent opened a Parisian branch in the neighborhood adjacent to the Sorbonne.  In 1629, King Louis XIII approved one of the abbess’s most cherished reforms: the election of the abbess by the convent nuns themselves rather than by royal appointment; the term of office would now be fixed (three years) rather than lifetime.  The nuns elected Mère Geneviève Tardiff as Mère Angélique’s successor in 1630.  The new episcopal overseer of the convent, Bishop Sebastien Zamet, opposed Mère Angélique on the nature of conventual reform; the austere Angelican reform was soon replaced by more theatrical liturgies and greater intercourse with the Parisian lay elite.  The effort of Zamet and Mère Angélique to develop a new religious order, the ephemeral Institut du Saint-Sacrement (1633-36), ended in bitter failure.  The election of Mère Angélique’s sister Mère Agnès Arnauld as Port-Royal’s new abbess in 1636 permitted a swift return to the principles of the Angelican reform.  Appointed as novice mistress, Mère Angélique now focused on the spiritual and intellectual formation of younger community members.

The restoration of the Angelican reform also marked the transformation of Port-Royal into a bastion of Jansenism.  Jean de Hauranne, abbé de Saint-Cyran, became the convent chaplain.  A friend and disciple of Cornelius Jansen, Louvain theologian and bishop of Ypres, Saint-Cyran propagated the radical Augustinianism of Jansen through sermons, lectures, and spiritual direction.  Typical Jansenist themes included radical human depravity, the centrality of predestination, the small number of the elect, complete dependence on divine grace for salvation, and moral rigorism.  The imprisonment of Saint-Cyran (1638-43) initiated the French government’s campaign against the convent and its Jansenist theology, perceived as heretical and supportive of political dissidence.

In subsequent decades, the Jansenist orientation of Port-Royal intensified.  Devoted to meditation and scholarship, a community of laymen living in the environs of the convent (the solitaires) published the works of Augustine, Jansen, Saint-Cyran, and other authors favored by the Jansenists.   These works became the staples of the convent school curriculum and of the texts read aloud during convent meals.  The Arnauld family spearheaded the Jansenist movement.  Mère Angélique’s brother Antoine the Younger Arnauld emerged as the school’s leading theologian; her brother Henri Arnauld, bishop of Angers, defended Jansenism in the episcopate; her brother Robert Arnauld d’Andilly became the most prolific of the solitaire translators and editors.  Through correspondence Mère Angélique personally participated in the philosophical and theological disputes occasioned by Antoine Arnauld’s Frequent Communion (1643), Blaise Pascal’s Provincial Letters (1656), and Jean de Brisacier’s anti-Jansenist Jansenism Confounded (1651).

In 1661 Louis XIV intensified the campaign against Port-Royal.  The French government demanded that all clerics, teachers, and members of religious orders sign a statement in which they assented to the papacy’s condemnation of five heretical theses allegedly found in Jansen’s Augustinus.  To guide the perplexed conscience of Jansenists during “the crisis of the signature,” Antoine Arnauld developed the droit/fait distinction.  According to this distinction, the judgment of the church on matters of faith and morals (droit) binds the conscience of the faithful, since such judgments were essential to the church’s divine mission of guiding people to salvation.  On judgments of empirical fact (fait), however, the church’s judgment is fallible, open to subsequent alteration or even reversal.  Using the droit/fait distinction, the Jansenists could assent to the church’s condemnation of the five condemned theses concerning grace and freedom; however, they could not assent to what they considered the church’s erroneous judgment of fact that Jansen had actually defended these heretical theories.

Despite Mère Angélique’s efforts at intervention with civil and ecclesiastic authorities, the campaign of coercion against Port-Royal stiffened.  In April 1661 the throne closed the convent school and novitiate; the convent’s chaplain and confessors were exiled.  In June 1661 the nuns reluctantly signed the controversial statement concerning Jansen but they declared that they only offered a reserved assent, to be interpreted according to the droit/fait distinction.  At the urging of Louis XIV, the Vatican quickly annulled the reserved signature and demanded unconditional submission to all the church’s judgments in the controversy.

In the midst of the crisis Mère Angélique Arnauld died on August 6, 1661.

2. Works

From a philosophical perspective, two works written by Mère Angélique Arnauld merit particular attention.  They are her correspondence and a series of conferences she gave at Port-Royal.

Published in 1742-44 as the three-volume Letters of Reverend Mère Angélique Arnauld, Abbess and Reformer of Port-Royal [L], the massive correspondence of Mère Angélique includes more than thirteen hundred letters and more than one hundred correspondents.  Her letters to her scholarly brothers, Antoine Arnauld and Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, clearly express her philosophical Augustinianism.  She repeatedly declares herself a “disciple of Saint Augustine” and defends neo-Augustinian positions on the nature of virtue, the critique of casuistry, and the relationship between grace and freedom.  Her letters to her nephew Antoine Le Maître and her niece Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly present the abbess’s theories of the rights of the conscience and the limits of civil and ecclesiastical authority.  Numerous letters study the exercise of authority by women.  In her correspondence with fellow women superiors, Mère Angélique emphasizes the right of superiors to act as the convent’s principal spiritual director, including the right to appoint the convent’s chaplain and confessors and to instruct the nuns in theological matters germane to convent life.  Her extensive correspondence with Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland, analyzes the virtues necessary for Christian women to govern others in the civic sphere and to endure reversals of fortune.

The correspondence also indicates Mère Angélique’s philosophical and theological culture.  Outside of the Bible, Saint Augustine is the author most cited in the letters; his Confessions are the work most frequently quoted.  The abbess often cites neo-Augustinian authors in the Jansenist circle: Saint-Cyran, Blaise Pascal, Antoine Arnauld, Pierre Nicole, Claude Lancelot, Antoine Singlin, and Antoine Le Maître.   Saint Teresa of Avila, whose works were translated into French by Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, is the most influential of the women authors cited by Mère Angélique, especially in her considerations on the exercise of authority by women.

Published in 1757, Speeches or Conferences of Reverend Mother Marie-Angélique Arnauld, Abbess and Reformer of Port-Royal [C] are transcriptions of the informal talks given by the abbess to the nuns at Port-Royal during the 1650s.  In these conferences the abbess often addresses moral issues pertinent to convent life.  She argues that it is intention rather than the quality of an act that determines the act’s moral worth.  Her severe judgments on minor ethical lapses by nuns and laity reflect the influence of Saint-Cyran’s moral rigorism.

Other major works by Mère Angélique include her autobiographical Report Written by Mère Angélique Arnauld, in which the abbess defends her policy of conventual reform, and her Commentary on the Rule of Saint Benedict, especially her discussion of the monastic virtue of humility.

3. Philosophical Themes

Angélique Arnauld develops philosophical arguments in three major areas: philosophy of God, especially the question of divine attributes; moral philosophy, in particular theory of the virtues; and gender theory, especially as it relates to the education and spiritual rights of women.  Arnauld’s philosophical reflection is subordinated to her larger theological project of Augustinian theology and reflects the distinctive culture of a convent devoted to the Jansenist cause.

a. Apophatic Theology

In her presentation of the divine attributes, Mère Angélique focuses on God’s incomprehensibility.  This apophatic theology stresses that what the human agent cannot grasp about the divine essence far surpasses what the human agent claims to know through positive images and concepts.

This incapacity to penetrate God’s essence stems from the stark alterity between divine and human natures.  “Everything God does is above human ability.  It is incomprehensible to our minds.  If we exist before God as if we were the smallest ants, is it so strange that we can neither know him nor grasp his intentions…. Between human beings and God there is no proportion.  They must acknowledge that God is a being infinitely superior to them.  As a result, it is impossible for them to know his ways” [C, 254].  Analogical affirmations of God’s attributes collapse in such an account of divine/human otherness.  The sinful nature of postlapsarian humanity deepens the chasm between humanity and God.  Only divine self-revelation can disclose a glimmer of God’s authentic nature to a human reason enticed by idols of its own imagination.

Arnauld’s apophatic theology underscores a particular dimension of divine incomprehensibility: inscrutability.  Although the Christian affirms the operation of divine providence in the ordering of the world, the accurate interpretation of God’s intention behind a particular historical act eludes human power.  “The judgments and ways of God are admirable.  Often God seems to want to destroy when he wants to edify.  What appears to be the result of his wrath and justice is actually the result of his mercy.  Blessed are the souls who perceive in every event only God’s holy will in order to submit to it” [L; to the Abbess of Gif; 23 December 1651].  Arnauld’s appeal to God’s inscrutability also expresses the voluntarist cast of her philosophy of God and of human nature.  It is divine sovereignty and self-abandonment to the divine will that are central in the convenant between God and the believer.

b. Virtue Theory

In her correspondence and conferences, Mère Angélique not only exhorts her public to the practice of virtue; she repeatedly defines the virtues in the context of monastic life.  Furthermore, she defends an Augustinian account of the moral virtues.  Authentic moral virtue can only spring from the operation of the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity.  The theological virtues themselves are the gift of divine grace, not the creation of human endeavor.  Apparently natural virtues, such as the cardinal virtue of courage, are only the masks of pride.

Arnauld’s discussion of the virtues privileges those moral habits typical of conventual life.  Rooted in the monastic vow of poverty, the virtue of poverty not only renounces personal possessions and cultivates sympathy for the materially poor; it refuses all aesthetic pleasures, even those found in liturgical arts and ceremonies.  Contempt for the world inevitably provokes persecution by the world.  “Many graces of God are required in order to disdain the world and tolerate its disdain for us….It is impossible for us to hate the world without the world hating us and considering us fools” [L; To Mademoiselle de Luzanci; September 7, 1650].  The centerpiece of monastic virtue, piety demands complete oblation of oneself.  Authentic piety requires total abolition of human personal desire as one obeys the divine will.  “God has given everything to humanity so it will give everything to him.  By this sacrifice it obtains from God’s goodness the grace to possess him and to reign with him forever” [L; to Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland; November 12, 1655].  The moral rigorism typical of the Jansenist movement marks this account of the nature of the prominent virtues in monastic life.  Militant opposition to the world accompanies every authentic expression of moral virtue.

The theocentric framework of Arnauld’s virtue theory also appears in her analysis of more secular virtues.  Patience is rooted in the recognition of our grave sinfulness before God.  Tolerating the imperfections of others prevents us from descending into moral complacency and the illusion of personal perfection.  “To avoid falling, we must humbly tolerate the faults of others and of ourselves.  We are born in sin and we will be totally liberated from it only at the moment of our death” [L; to Madame Allen; May 12, 1665].  Even the Socratic virtue of self-knowledge undergoes theological reconstruction.  The moral self-knowledge granted by divine grace surpasses any self-knowledge acquired by the natural means of reflection.  “If you had spent an entire year making an examination of conscience with the most meticulous care, it would have been inferior to the moment when God touched your heart.  You could not have been as well prepared and you could not have known your faults as well as you do right now without any personal examination of conscience.  It is grace alone that can grant us such knowledge” [L; to Anne de Rohan, Princess de Guéménée; November 15, 1629].  Authentic self-knowledge thus emerges as a product of divine illumination.

Arnauld’s analysis of the moral virtues affirms a traditional tenet of Augustinian virtue theory: that the allegedly natural virtues praised by pagan philosophers are in fact disguised vices and that authentic moral virtue is rooted in the theological virtues grafted into the human will by divine grace.   Following the Augustinian perspective, Mère Angélique dismisses the neoclassical virtues of magnanimity and courage as masks of self-satisfaction.  “There is nothing more pleasant for a generous person than the act of giving.  People so possess courage according to the world’s standard fear nothing so much as asking for something.  It is characteristic of the rich to give and the poor to receive” [C, 71].  It is selfless intention, rather than external act, that is the criterion for the existence of authentic virtue.  Only the presence of the divinely infused virtues of faith, hope, and charity can provide the proper theocentric motivation for the exercise of the moral virtues.  Arnauld’s analysis of these theological virtues expresses her typical rigorism.  Faith plunges the moral agent into combat against the world, the flesh, and the devil.  Authentic hope turns the believer against the sinful hope of domination that poisons the courtier.  Charity demands the annihilation of the self.  “Charity is nothing other than the love of God and the love of God is an ardent desire that God reign in everything and that all creatures annihilate themselves and recognize his supreme grandeur and infinite majesty” [C, 77].

Reflecting the Jansenist combat with the French throne and episcopate, Mère Angélique stresses the virtue of suffering for the truth.  Under persecution, this virtue of sacrificial witness to the truth has become the hallmark of the convent’s moral character.  “I am overwhelmed by the vision I have of the great and singular grace God has granted us to suffer for the truth, trying to serve the souls he has redeemed by his death” [L; to Antoine Arnauld; early 1644].  This suffering for the contested truths of salvation, however, must be animated by the theological virtue of charity.  Mère Angélique censures the sarcasm that has increasingly stained the polemical defenses of the convent by Jansenist sympathizers.  “I only desire that God may deign to fill you deeply, not only with the knowledge of the truth, but with a perfect love that you practice faithfully and that gives you a humble patience toward everything.  The current impassioned applause from so many people disturbs me” [C; to Antoine Arnauld; April 1644].  To be authentic, even the convent’s distinctive willingness to suffer persecution for the sake of doctrinal truth must remain rooted in the infused virtue of charity toward one’s opponents.

c. Theological Determinism

Angélique Arnauld’s heavy emphasis on divine grace as the cause of all virtuous action often appears close to a species of theological determinism.  So central is the initiative and sovereignty of God in all cosmic and moral activity that free will appears to disappear.  Human beings remain voluntaristic beings inasmuch as they can choose one course of action over another after deliberation, but the deliberative and elective activities appear destined by concupiscence to involve the selection of evil unless divine grace intervenes through an inscrutable decree of divine providence.

The abbess reinforces this theological determinism by her insistence on the Augustinian doctrine of predestination.  The salvation of sinners, illustrated through the conversion of the good thief by Jesus on the cross, is due entirely to divine initiative, not to the personal merit of the saved.  “God grants his grace to whomever he pleases.  This is seen in the prayer of the thief he touched and converted in the very act of sinning.  At first he blasphemed just like the other thief; nevertheless, one is taken and the other is left behind.  Jesus Christ gazes at the former with his great mercy and leaves the latter by an effect of justice that condemns him” [C, 108].  Moral conversion and the concomitant status of being saved are caused uniquely by divine election.

Reinforcing the Augustinian framework of predestination, Arnauld rejects the compromise solution of human cooperation with divine grace.  The abbess insists on the comprehensive nature of divine causation in the act of salvation.  “The creature could never cooperate with the grace of God.  It would lose infinitely more than it could keep for its use.  God’s grace always suffered some loss when it came to us….The creature’s incapacity stems from sin, which is infinitely opposed to this grace” [C, 365].  It is in her discussions of grace and salvation that the theological determinism of Mère Angélique becomes the most pronounced.

Arnauld’s emphasis on divine causation is not without paradox.  The abbess repeatedly exhorts her listeners and correspondents to act virtuously and to seek God’s favor, as if they exercised authentic free will and responsibility.  But these appeals to moral reform find scant justification in a metaphysics and a moral philosophy that make divine volition the unique cause of physical and ethical action.

d. Gender and Right

The convent is not simply the site for the elaboration of Mère Angélique’s Augustinian philosophy; her corpus defends the right of women, specifically of nuns, to exercise judgments of conscience on matters of theological dispute, even when this entails conflict with political and religious authorities.  It also defends the correlative rights of women to education, to theological culture, and to limited autonomy through the selection of superiors and of constitutional law.

In many writings, Arnauld analyzes how women should exercise their rightful authority in the religious and civic spheres.  Despite the rigorism of her moral views, Mère Angélique argues that flexibility is central in a religious superior’s exercise of authority.  Women superiors must tailor their judgments to the needs of the individual subject.  “Superiors must be extremely reserved in all their words.  They must  weigh all of them according to the golden measure of holy charity.  Whether they are exhorting, reproving, or consoling, they must proportion themselves to the capacity of each soul” [L; to the Anonciade superior in Boulogne; May 14, 1640].  Authentic conventual governance involves respect of each individual’s experience and of the superior’s personal judgment in a particular case.

Legalism constitutes a particular danger for this exercise of personalized spiritual governance.  Mère Angélique criticizes the tendency of overly detailed constitutions in religious orders to suffocate the right of women superiors to exercise substantial freedom in the governance of their subjects.  “In the area of penances, it seems to me that one should usually grant freedom to a superior to act according to her inclinations.  She must try to take into account the spirit of God and the different circumstances and not try to regulate all the nuns according to the same manner.  The letter kills and the spirit gives life” [L; to Monsieur Macquet; January 4, 1635].  These counsels on the proper exercise of authority religious superiors reinforce the principal provisions of the Angelican reform of the convent.  Nuns are to elect their own superiors and to draw up their constitutions and legislation in chapter.  Superiors are to act as the principal spiritual directors of their subjects with the authority to appoint chaplains and to direct schools and retreat programs for laywomen.

In her extensive correspondence with Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland, Arnauld evokes the virtues central for the exercise of civil authority by women.  Like nuns, monarchs must practice the annihilation of self that unites the believer completely to God.  “God will treat you in his judgment just as you have treated him here.  He will honor those who have honored him as their sovereign lord, considering themselves nothing at all before his divine majesty” [L; to Marie-Louis de Gonzague, queen of Poland; January 20, 1655].  In particular, the queen must practice the love of enemies, a theological virtue that proves especially difficult in time of war.  “Your soul should often ponder these words of Our Lord Jesus Christ when he was nailed to the cross in the last extremity and by the most horrible malice and cruelty that could be imagined: ‘Father, forgive them; they did not know what they do.’  It was not only those who crucified the Son of God who did not know that he was the king of glory; it is those who make war on you” [L; to Marie-Louise de Gonzague de Poland; November 5, 1655].

As the persecution of Port-Royal intensified, Mère Angélique insisted on the right and duty of women to follow an informed conscience on the theological disputes of the moment.  Appeals to obedience cannot force a nun to assent to a judgment by a political or ecclesiastical authority she believes to be erroneous.  Citing the precedent of Teresa of Avila, Arnauld urges Queen Anne of Austria, the French queen-mother, to intervene on behalf of the Port-Royal nuns against the errors of the church on the question of Jansenism.  “I believe that God will use the wisdom of Your Majesty and the wisdom of the king, as he used Phillip II, the ancestor of Your Majesty, in the past, to save Saint Teresa from the greatest persecution she had ever known.  We see in her writings that even the pope had been wrongly informed about her and the nuns of her order and that his nuncio had been prejudiced against her, thus pushing this conflict, in her own words, to the last step of violence” [L; to Anne of Austria, queen-mother of France; May 25, 1661].  Against the fallible, prudential judgments of both church and state on matters of fact, both nuns and laywomen enjoyed the right to challenge judgments that appeared to wound truth and charity.

4. Interpretation and Relevance

Several factors have impeded a properly philosophical appreciation of the works of Angélique Arnauld.  First, apologists for Jansenism have long argued that Mère Angélique was simply ignorant of the theological controversies erupting during the crisis of the signature.  Gazier’s defense of the Port-Royal nuns (1929) is typical of such apologetic.  Furthermore, Mère Angélique’s spirituality has often been described as practical, more interested in moral than speculative issues.  Undoubtedly, Mère Angélique never read Jansen’s Augustinus.  But she had certainly read Jansen’s Reformation of the Interior Man, translated by her brother Robert Arnauld d’Andilly from the Latin original, and she had studied Saint-Cyran’s Popular Theology, a summary of Jansenist doctrine that served as the convent school’s major catechetical reference.  The misleading portrait of Mère Angélique as a theological innocent baffled by the intricacies of the ecclesiastical quarrel over grace has long closed her canon to philosophical commentary.

Second, the thought of Mère Angélique has often been simply assimilated to the Augustinianism of the male leaders of the Jansenist movement.  While the abbess was clearly influenced by the constellation of Augustinian thinkers who surrounded her, especially her brother Antoine Arnauld and her mentor Saint-Cyran, she maintains her own distinctive voice in this school of radical Augustinianism.  Her analysis of monastic virtue in a conventual context and her defense of the spiritual rights of women against political and ecclesiastical coercion reflect her own theoretical and gendered priorities.

Finally, the philosophy of Mère Angélique has been obscured by its forbidding theological architecture.  The abbess expresses her theories in monastic genres foreign to the philosophical treatise: letters of spiritual direction, abbatial conferences, and commentaries on patristic texts.  The substantive issues which preoccupied her appear similarly foreign to contemporary philosophy.  Her philosophy of divine attributes, moral virtue, and personal rights are embedded in quarrels over grace and monastic reform that can appear arcane.  Philosophical analysis of her works requires a grasp of the early modern theological controversies which provided the occasion for the abbess’s philosophical speculation.

The current revival of interest in the philosophy of Angélique Arnauld is fueled in large part by the feminist effort to expand the cannon of the humanities in the early modern period.  Mère Angélique’s defense of the rights of women to exercise religious and political authority has emerged as a central interest in contemporary commentary on her own writings.  Kostroun’s study of Port-Royal (2003) focuses on the gendered subversion of authority justified by Mère Angélique and her associates.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Entretiens ou conférences de la Révérende Mère Marie-AngéliqueArnauld, abbesse et réformatrice de Port-Royal (Brussels: A. Boudet, 1757).
    • [Transcribed largely by her niece Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly, this series of conferences delivered in the 1650s at Port-Royal expresses the moral rigorism of the abbess.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Lettres de la Révérende Mère Marie-Angélique Arnauld, abbesse et réformatrice de Port-Royal, 3 vols. (Utrechet: Aux dépens de la Compagnie, 1742-44).
    • [The facsimile edition of this collection of Mère Angélique’s letters produced by Phénix Éditions in 2003 contains an excellent introduction by Jean Lesaulnier, who identifies the various networks of correspondents with the abbess.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Rélation écrite par la Mère Angélique Arnauld, ed. Louis Cognet (Paris: Grasset, 1949).
    • [This autobiographical text is an apologetic for the Angelican reform of Port-Royal and a description of the burgeoning persecution of the convent and the Jansenist movement.]

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bugnion-Secrétan, Perle. La Mère Angélique Arnauld, 1591-1661, après ses écrits (Paris: Cerf, 1991).
    • [This biography of the abbess focuses on her writings, with particular attention to their polemical context.]
  • Chédeozeau, Bernard. “Idéal intellectuel et vie monastique à Port-Royal,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 37 (1997), 57-74.
    • [This article examines the intellectual culture developed at Port-Royal under the Angelican reform and compares it favorably to the anti-intellectual piety dominating most of the convents of the period.]
  • Conley, John J. Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Notre Dame (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 2009), 43-112.
    • [This chapter analyzes and critiques the neo-Augustinian philosophy developed by the abbess in her letters and conferences.]
  • Gastellier, Fabian, Angélique Arnauld (Paris: Fayard, 1998).
    • [This biography studies the politics of the abbess’s civil and ecclesiastical context.]
  • Gazier, Cécile. Histoire du monastére de Port-Royal (Paris: Perrin, 1929).
    • [This pro-Janenist apologetic history depicts a theologically uncultured Mère Angélique, baffled by the arcane doctrinal disputes by which the enemies of Port-Royal attempted to destroy the convent through charges of heresy.]
  • Kostroun, Daniella. “A Formula for Disobedience: Jansenism, Gender, and the Feminist Paradox,” Journal of Modern History 75 (2003), 483-522.
    • [This article analyzes the subversive nature of the gendered arguments employed by Mère Angélique and her associates against royal and episcopal demands to submission on matters of conscience.]
  • Rowan, Mary. “Angélique Arnauld’s Web of Feminine Friendships: Letters to Jeanne de Chantal and the Queen of Poland,” in Les femmes au grand siècle; le Baroque; Musique et littérature; Music et liturgie, ed. David Wetsel et al. (Tübingen: Narr, 2003), 53-59.
    • [This study of the abbess’s correspondence focuses on her relationship with two prominent women who exercised authority in the religious and civic spheres respectively.]

Author Information

John J. Conley
Email: jconley1@loyola.edu
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Last updated: April 11, 2011 | Originally published: