Agnès Arnauld (1593-1671)

An abbess of the Jansenist convent of Port-Royal, Mère Agnès Arnauld developed an Augustinian philosophy shaped by the mystical currents of the French Counter-Reformation.  Her philosophy of God depicts a deity who is radically other than his creatures.  Only a negative theology, a theology of what God is not, can explore the divine attributes.  In her ethical theory, Mère Agnès contextualizes moral virtue by analyzing those religious virtues proper to a nun in a contemplative order.  Influenced by the mystical école française, the abbess stresses self-annihilation as the summit of the nun’s life of virtue.  In her legal writings tied to the reformation of the convent, the abbess defends the spiritual freedom of women.  Women are to enjoy vocational freedom, the freedom to pursue education, and the freedom to hold opinions on disputed theological questions.  Similarly, women are to enjoy substantial freedom in the exercise of their authority as superiors of convents.  During the persecution of the convent, Mère Agnès developed a moral code of resistance to abuses of power.  She details the conditions under which cooperation with illegitimate commands of civil or ecclesiastical authority could be tolerated or rejected.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Negative Theology
    2. Monastic Virtue Theory
    3. Law and Freedom
    4. Ethics of Resistance
  4. Interpretation and Relevance
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on December 31, 1593, Jeanne Arnauld was the third daughter of Antoine Arnauld the Elder and Marie Catherine Marion Arnauld.  From birth, the prominent family of jurists had designated the infant for an abbacy in a convent.  Through negotiations with King Henri IV and fraudulent transaction with the Vatican, in which documents attesting the candidate’s age were falsified, her maternal grandfather Simon Marion had Jeanne appointed the abbess of the Benedictine convent of Saint-Cyr in 1599.  Assuming her religious name of Mère Cathérine –Agnès de Saint-Paul (commonly known as Mère Agnès), the infant abbess took with relish to the liturgical offices and other practices of the monastery.

As her elder sister’s reform of Port-Royal became increasingly stormy, Mère Agnès devoted her time to supporting Mère Angélique in the work of Port-Royal’s transformation.  Sealing her commitment to monastic reform, Mère Agnès renounced the abbacy of Saint-Cyr in 1610, was clothed in the Cistercian habit of Port-Royal in 1611, and pronounced her vows as a member of the community in 1612.  Mère Agnès assisted her sister in governing the burgeoning convent through a series of major offices: mistress of novices, subprioress, and vicar abbess.

During the decade of the 1610s, Mère Agnès emerged as one of the convent’s leading spiritual directors.  Her extensive correspondence reveals the eclectic influences on her thought: the Jesuit Jean Suffren; the Capuchin Archange de Pembroke; and the Feuillant Eustache de Saint-Paul Assaline.  François de Sales influenced the characteristic moderation expressed in Mère Agnès’s judgments.  On issues of gender and mystical states, the central reference was Teresa of Avila.  Her Path of Perfection, Interior Castle, and Autobiography are repeatedly cited.

In the 1620s, the convent became more turbulent.  With the transfer of the convent from the rural valley of the Chevreuese to the Parisian Saint-Jacques neighborhood in 1625, the convent came under the influence of new Oratorian chaplains, notably Pierre de Bérulle and Charles de Condren.  A disciple of the Platonist Pseudo-Dionysius, Bérulle encouraged an apophatic mysticism, which stressed the incapacity of the human mind to know God through image or concept. Condren emphasized complete abandonment to God’s will, climaxed by self-annihilation.  During the Oratorian ascendancy (1625-1636), Sebastien Zamet, an episcopal overseer of the convent and an ally of the Oratorians, pushed the convent in a less austere direction.  Liturgical offices became more complicated, church decorations became more sumptuous, and nuns were encouraged to share their latest mystical insights with devout laity in the front parlors.  The original reformers quietly fumed at what they considered a regression toward conventual decadence.

During the Oratorian ascendancy, Mère Agnès composed a small treatise, Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament, under the direction of Condren.  Honoring Christ in the Eucharist, each of the sixteen stanzas devoted itself to the sixteen centuries elapsed since the Last Supper.  At Condren’s suggestion, the pious litany was expanded; the nun explained the meaning of the various apophatic titles ascribed to God. [An apophatic theology considers God to be ineffable, and it attempts to describe God in terms of what God is not.]   As the Chaplet quietly circulated among the nuns and lay benefactors of Port-Royal, a crisis erupted in 1633.  Octave Bellegarde, another episcopal supervisor of Port-Royal who disapproved of Zamet’s reform and of the Oratorians’ speculative mysticism, denounced the pamphlet as heretical and temerarious.  In June 1633, a committee of the theology faculty of the Sorbonne condemned Mère Agnès’s text as destructive of morals because of its stress on passive abandonment to God.  The Jesuit Étienne Binet seconded the condemnation, while the Jansenist Jean de Hauranne, abbé de Saint-Cyran vigorously defended the orthodoxy of the treatise.  The Vatican’s halfhearted intervention into the pamphlet war pleased neither party.  Mère Agnès’s text was withdrawn from circulation but neither was its theology condemned nor was it placed on the Index of Forbidden Books.

During her first abbacy over Port-Royal (1636-42), Mère Agnès restored the convent to the austerity of the Angelican reform.  Her relationship with the convent’s new chaplain, however, proved less than amicable.  A close friend and disciple of Cornelius Jansen, bishop of Ypres and Louvain theologian, Saint-Cyran imported the radical Augustinian theology of Jansen into the convent.  This theology’s emphasis on practical morality and the value of occasional deprivation of the sacraments clashed with the abbess’s more exuberant mystical piety.  By the time of Saint-Cyran’s imprisonment by Richelieu (1638-43), however, Mère Agnès had become a partisan of the Jansenist movement and intensified the convent’s cult of Saint-Cyran through the circulation of his letters and conferences.

At the end of her abbacy, Mère Agnès was appointed the convent’s mistress of novices.  The nun flourished in this role of spiritual counselor both through conversation with the novices and through correspondence with an extended number of correspondents.  Her letters to Jacqueline Pascal on the proper moment for entering Port-Royal express the prudence and moderation for which the nun was renowned: “Our Lord wants to purify you by this delay because you have not always desired it.  It is necessary to have a hunger and thirst for justice to expiate the disgust one once had for this vocation in earlier times.  Saint Augustine wonderfully describes this delay of God’s grace in the souls of those who desire the abundance of God’s grace, which God has postponed [L; to Jacqueline Pascal; February 25, 1650].”  Through her correspondence, the nun also participated in the philosophical and theological controversies of the day swirling around the publication of Antoine Arnauld’s Frequent Communion and Jean Brisacier’s Jansenism Confounded.

When Mère Agnès assumed her second abbacy of Port-Royal (1658-1681), the controversy over Jansenism had erupted into a crisis.  The French throne demanded that every priest, nun, and teacher in the realm sign a statement assenting to the Vatican’s condemnation of five heretical propositions found in Jansens’s massive Augustinus (published posthumously in 1640).  Using an ingenious theological distinction, Antoine Arnauld the Younger argued that members of the church were only bound to assent to church judgments of droit (concerning faith and morals); they were not bound to accept church judgments of fait (empirical fact).  The first type of judgments was essential to the church’s mission of salvation, whereas the second was not.  In the “crisis of the signature,” the Jansenists were willing to assent to the condemnation of the five theses concerning grace and freedom, but they could not assent to the erroneous judgment that Jansen had supported such heresies.   Mère Agnès indicates her refusal to giving an unreserved signature to the controversial document.  “The church is attacked in truth and charity, the two columns that support it.  This is what they are trying to destroy by this unfortunate signature, which we would offer against the truth and thereby destroy the charity we should have for the dead as well as the living.  We would be subscribing to the condemnation of a holy bishop who never taught the heresies they impute to him [L; to Madame de Foix; December 10, 1662].”

As the 1660s progressed, Mère Agnès witnessed the progressive intensification of the persecution of the convent.  The convent school and novitiate were closed; the chaplains were expelled.  Foreign nuns hostile to Jansenism were imported to govern Port-Royal, now surrounded by an armed guard.  The most recalcitrant nuns, including Mère Agnès, were exiled to foreign convents.  Mère Agnès herself was placed with the Visitation nuns; she refused to sign the controversial statement although some of her own nieces in the convent eventually yielded.  By the end of the 1660s, a truce was arranged to resolve the growing scandal of an entire convent under interdict.  In 1669, the “Peace of the Church” permitted the reopening of the convent, the resumption of liturgical life, and the reopening of the convent school and novitiate.  Several uncharacteristically placid years descended on Port-Royal.

Mère Agnès Arnauld died on February 19, 1671.

2. Works

A prolific author, Mère Agnès was one of the few Port-Royal nuns to see her works published during her lifetime.  Circulating first as a devotional pamphlet, Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament (1626) caused an international dispute over its controversial apophatic approach to the divine attributes.  Louvain, the Jansenists, and the Oratorians defended the work, while the Jesuits and the Sorbonne opposed it.  Working in collaboration with Mère Angélique Arnauld and Antoine Arnauld, Mère Agnès was the principal author of the Constitutions of Port-Royal (1665), the legal framework for the Angelican reform of the convent and a theological text marked by the abbess’s Oratorian insistence on the annihilation of oneself.  Her Image of a Perfect and an Imperfect Nun (1665) provides the fullest exposition of her virtue theory.  The contemplative virtues central to the monastic life, especially the spirit of adoration, are stressed; to be authentic, virtue must empty itself of all self-interest.  Her accent on the intellectual nature of religious contemplation provoked a new controversy.  Martin de Barcos (1696) and Jean Desmarets de Saint-Sorlin (1665) criticized her approach as too intellectualist; Pierre de Nicole (1679) defended her use of reason in meditation.  The Spirit of Port-Royal (1665) underscores self-annihilation in its treatment of the spiritual character of the convent community.

The posthumously published works of Mère Agnès also make a single contribution to the philosophical and theological canon of Port-Royal.  An exercise in moral casuistry, Counsels on the Conduct Which the Nuns Should Maintain in the Event of a Change in the Governance of the Convent (1718) tackles the problem of moral cooperation with evil as it analyzes which actions would be legitimate and illegitimate in obeying the civil and ecclesiastical authorities who were persecuting the convent.  The two-volume Letters of Mère Agnès Arnauld, abbess of Port-Royal (1858) reflects the Augustinian axis of the abbess’s philosophy.   She repeatedly refers to the texts of Saint Augustine himself and modern Augustinian writers such as Jansen, Saint-Cyran, Antoine Arnauld, and Teresa of Avila in justifying her positions on spiritual government and theological controversy.

3. Philosophical Themes

The philosophical reflection of Mère Agnès Arnauld follows two primary avenues: philosophy of God and moral philosophy.  Influenced by the apophatic theology of the Oratorians, her philosophy of God stresses God’s alterity (otherness) and the incapacity of human concepts to penetrate the divine essence.  Her moral philosophy develops a theocentric account of the virtues central to the monastic life.  It also presents a casuistic analysis of the permissible and impermissible modes of cooperation with the persecutors of Port-Royal.

a. Negative Theology

In the Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament [PC], Mère Agnès provides the most substantial expression of her apophatic theology.  A devotional treatise written in praise of Christ’s presence in the Eucharist, the Private Chaplet stresses the negative attributes of God disclosed in the eucharistic Christ.  The adorer of the Eucharist cannot penetrate the essence of the godhead, affirmed more accurately by terms expressing what he is not than by those expressing what he is.

A series of titles express this divine unknowability.  God is inaccessible. “He remains in himself, letting creatures remain in the incapacity to approach him [PC no.11].”  God is incomprehensible.  “He alone knows his ways.  He justifies to himself alone the plans he has for his creatures [PC no.12].”  God is entirely sovereign.  “He acts as the first cause without any subordination to the ends he has given himself [PC no.13].”  Other negative divine attributes include illimitability, inapplicability, and incommunicability.

Even the positive attributes ascribed to God receive an apophatic reinterpretation.  God’s holiness is entirely other than the alleged holiness of certain human creatures.  “The company God wants to keep with humanity is separate from it.  He resides only in himself.  It is not reasonable that God should approach us because we are only sin [PC no.1].”  The existence allegedly shared by both God and creatures is illusory.  Divine existence only manifests the non-being of creatures, especially peccatory human creatures.  “God is everything he wants to be and makes all other beings disappear.  As the sun blots out all other light, God exists simply to exist [PC no.4].”  The analogy of being disappears in this exaltation of divine alterity.

Throughout her writings, Mère Agnès emphasizes the rupture between God and human beings.  Analogical presentations of the divine attributes are inevitably anthropomorphic projections of human attributes into the divine essence.  As in the act of adoration before the Eucharist, the primary act of metaphysical affirmation of God is the adorer’s humble recognition of his or her utter incapacity to imagine or name the magnum mysterium that is the cause and the end of cosmic and human existence.  Only the language of negation and alterity can prevent both piety and philosophical reflection from deteriorating into imaginary projection.

b. Monastic Virtue Theory

In Image of a Perfect and an Imperfect Nun [IP], Mère Agnès analyzes the moral virtues proper to a nun committed to a strictly cloistered community.  Her distinction between the perfect and imperfect is not the one between virtue and vice.  The dividing line between authentic virtue and its subtle counterfeits lies in the difference between theocentric and anthropocentric postures of the will.

The monastic virtue of reverence illustrates the difference.  Both perfect and imperfect nuns practice their external obligations of divine worship and of reverence for their superiors.   The perfect focus on God alone, ignoring other creatures “as if they did not exist [IP, 7].”  The imperfect, however, suffer from a vacillating attention that “desires something other than God and that fears losing something other than God that pleases them [IP, 10].”  This anthropocentric turning on oneself corrupts the virtue that should be purely focused on God.

Other monastic virtues exemplify the split between anthropocentric and theocentric versions of virtue.  Perfect submission to the divine will accepts the periods of aridity and desolation which characterize spiritual maturation.  Imperfect submission, however, bridles at such deprivation and clings to sensible consolations.  Perfect zeal desires nothing other than the glory of God.  Imperfect zeal becomes fascinated with the external means used to glorify God and seeks recognition for its efforts.  Perfect repentance firmly renounces all sin and seeks solitude to reform one’s life.  Imperfect repentance vacillates and cannot give finality to its vague, contradictory desires for reform.  Recalling Pascal, Mère Agnès describes the vacillation of the imperfect soul: “Her mind is like a reed shaken by the wind, which makes it turn now this way and now that [IP, 53].”

This anti-anthropocentric account of virtue ultimately celebrates the annihilation of the self in the perfect practice of the monastic virtues.  Authentic humility entails recognition of one’s utter dependence on God for the least moral action.  “It is on this incapacity to perform the least good and to avoid the least evil without God’s help that the true nun establishes the unshakable foundation of humility [IP, 94].”  Similarly, authentic poverty acknowledges one’s utter non-existence in face of God.  “It is the knowledge that she has nothing that was hers before she was created out of nothing,  especially since the sin of Adam, who made all humanity worthy of not only losing the goods of heaven but of losing the goods of earth as well [IP, 100].”  Clearly influenced by the Oratorian spirituality of annihilation, the abbess depicts perfect virtue as a collapse of the moral agent into the divine will.

At the apex of the monastic virtues lie the contemplative virtues of solitude and adoration.  Authentic solitude permits the nun to recognize her utter uselessness in the face of God’s grandeur.  “God reduces us to be totally useless so that we might experience what the Prophet says: ‘Since the Lord is God, he has no need of our goods.’  This is to say that no matter how excellent our works may be, they provide no benefit to him; they are only advantageous for ourselves [IP, 148].”  In the act of adoration, the perfect nun experiences this self-annihilation in its fullest; she also discovers the source of this abolition of the human self in God’s operation of grace in the cross of Christ.  “She hears the voice of her Savior, who commands her to announce his death through her voluntary death to all things and to herself until he comes, which is to say, until she dies in her body.  He further tells us to find her glory and her rest only in the cross, in humiliation and privation of what she loves.  She should do so out of love for the one who dispossessed himself of his own glory, who annihilated himself, and who died for her salvation [IP, 160].”

This account of virtue is Augustinian in its stress on the utter necessity of grace for the performance of any moral action.  The “natural” virtues of prudence, fortitude, temperance, and justice are notable by their absence since they are illusory manifestations of pride.  The account is Oratorian inasmuch as it stresses the annihilation of the self as the key trait of the moral agent perfectly united to God in the practice of virtue.  It is also contemplative inasmuch as it integrates the practice of the moral virtues into the gaze of the adorer who knows through speculative experience and divine illumination how radically all good dispositions and good actions are caused by the sovereign godhead.  This architectural contemplative gaze simultaneously recognizes the utter nothingness of the human agent distorted by sin and concupiscence.

c. Law and Freedom

As the principal author of the Constitutions of the Monastery of Port-Royal [CM],. Mère Agnès crafted the basic legal structure for the reformed convent.  The piecemeal reforms effected by her sister Mère Angélique would now be embedded in a legal document recognized by ecclesiastical authority.  In the Constitutions, Mère Agnès also sketches her philosophy of freedom and rights in a gendered key.  The freedom of women to pursue a vocation, to develop a theological culture, and to exercise limited self-government are affirmed.  In particular, the authority of the convent’s abbess to govern and instruct her nuns without external interference is underscored.

Rooted in the Angelican reform, the Constitutions emphasize the vocational freedom of women.  The convent will only accept women who have indicated their desire to pursue a monastic calling free of parental pressure.  “We should not admit any girl if she is not truly called by God.  She should show by her life and actions a true and sincere desire to serve God.  Without this we should never admit anyone for any other reason, even when it is a question of the intelligence, the wealth, or the noble title the candidate might bring [CM, 54].”  To emphasize this vocational freedom, the Constitutions abolish the dowry requirement, long traditional for choir nuns in Benedictine and Cistercian convents.  “If a poor but excellent girl, clearly called by God, presents herself for admission, we should not refuse her, although the convent would be heavily burdened.  We would then hope that God who sent her would feed her.  We should not be afraid to make such commitments as long as we choose souls carefully and only accept souls rich in virtue instead of temporal advantages [CM, 74].”  Although this policy of vocational freedom faithfully followed the canon law of the church, it shocked French aristocratic opinion, long accustomed to placing unmotivated widows and surplus daughters in convents through the gift of a dowry.

Similarly, the education of women in Port-Royal’s convent school was to respect this vocational freedom.  The school was to accept only pupils whose parents had not already designated them for the married or cloistered life.  “We will only accept those girls whose parents offer them to God in indifference: that is, indifference as to whether they have decided to become nuns or whether they have decided to return to the world [CM, 99].”  For Mère Agnès, the major purpose of the convent school was to permit the pupils to discern their personal vocations through prayer, sacramental life, and dialogue with the teaching nuns.

The Constitutions also stress the spiritual freedom of the individual nun in her times of personal prayer.  In a period when many religious orders minutely prescribed methods of meditation, Mère Agnès insisted on the spontaneity and freedom which a nun must enjoy as she advances in prayerful maturity.  “Saint Benedict’s intention was that we should give the Holy Spirit room and time to stir up in us the spirit of meditation, which consists in a sincere desire to belong to God and to do so in purity and compunction of heart….True meditation is a celestial gift and not a human one.  It is the Holy Spirit praying for us when he makes us pray [CM, 43].”  Like virtue, prayer is theocentric in its very causation.  A certain illuminism emerges in this Augustinian account of prayer.

To exercise this contemplative freedom, the nun must develop an extensive theological culture.  In a period when personal meditation on Scripture was still considered suspect, Mère Agnès stipulates a comparatively wide number of theological texts to be studied by the nuns.  In addition to biblical reading, nuns are to meditate on works from the patristic period (Augustine, the desert fathers, Dorotheus and Bernard of Clairvaux) and the modern period (François de Sales, Louis of Grenada, and Teresa of Avila).

The nuns are also to enjoy limited self-governance.  The abbesses are to be elected by the nuns meeting in chapter.  The term of office was now to be fixed at three years, renewable for one additional term.  Although the bishop appoints a clerical overseer for the convent, the overseer is to be chosen from a list of three names presented by the abbess.  Similarly, the abbess is to exercise the right of approval for the chaplains and confessors who serve the convent.  The authority of the abbess in the reformed convent is especially pronounced.  She is to serve as the nuns’ principal spiritual director and to enjoy an extensive teaching role.  She is to provide lectures commenting on key monastic texts, such as the Rule of Saint Benedict.  In the conférence, one of the reformed Port-Royal’s creations, the abbess is to field the question of her fellow nuns on both practical and speculative issues troubling the convent.

So strong was the reformed convent’s accent on theological culture and debate that critics derided the Port-Royal nuns as théologiennes.  In Mère Agnès’ perspective, the authentic nun is the woman who freely pursues a personal vocation, who strengthens this vocation through substantial theological study, who chooses her own superiors, and who pursues God in spontaneous meditation guided by the Holy Spirit.  The challenge to the patriarchal tradition of the forced vocation and the illiterate convent was evident.

Even in her legal texts, the Augustinian philosophy of Mère Agnès is evident.  The Constitutions are not a blueprint for human efforts to build the ideal convent; they reflect the work of divine grace within the reformers.  “As Saint Augustine says, we must work to conquer our vices by constant efforts and ardent prayers, but we must recognize at the same time that our efforts as well as our prayers, if there is anything good in them, are the effects of grace [CM, 273].” Corporate, no less than individual, acts of virtue have a single causation in the operation of divine grace.

d. Ethics of Resistance

As the opposition to Port-Royal intensified, Mère Agnès composed Counsels on the Conduct Which Nuns Should Maintain in the Event of a Change in the Governance of the Convent [CC].  The work attempted to prepare the nuns to negotiate the persecutions which would soon overwhelm the convent.  Mère Agnès presciently saw the exile of recalcitrant nuns, the imposition of foreign superiors, and the use of ecclesiastical interdict (barring a Christian from participation in the sacraments) as probable tactics of the new persecution.  Her Counsels functions both as a casuistical manual, which instructs nuns on acceptable and unacceptable scenarios of cooperation with hostile authorities, and a moral exhortation, which analyzes the virtues the nuns should cultivate under duress.

If foreign superiors are imposed on the convent, the Port-Royal nuns should refuse to acknowledge their authority.  Such imposed superiors represent a violation of the convent’s constitutions, which have been duly approved by the Vatican and the French throne.  “These superiors cannot have a true authority by usurping a power that does not belong to them.  They will be intruders, even when they want to adorn themselves with the obedience due superiors [CC, 83].”  The nuns of Port-Royal have not pledged to follow generic vows of poverty, chastity, and obedience; with the approval of church and state, they have promised to live these vows in the convent of Port-Royal, ruled by its constitutions and laws.  The imposition of foreign superiors represents a serious violation of this vocational right.

In practice, the nun must distinguish between acceptable and unacceptable cooperation in the commands of these illegitimate superiors.  Material cooperation is the easiest.  The nun should quickly accept commands concerning manual labor, meals, and physical disposition of one’s space.  Even here, however, the nun must refuse commands to activities incompatible with the ethos of Port-Royal; making elaborate vestments or placing flowers on the altar, for example, would violate the convent’s austere understanding of poverty.  Moral cooperation with the illegitimate superiors should be refused.  The nun is not to reveal her convictions or feelings to the illegitimate superiors or their attendant clergy.  If a command is refused, no explanation is to be given.  Under no circumstances should the nun agree to submit to the demand of an unreserved signature on the statement assenting to the church’s condemnation of Jansen; to do so would be to deny the truth concerning grace.  Even conversations on this topic are to be avoided.

The problem of material cooperation when one is exiled to a foreign convent is comparatively easier.  A legitimate superior of a foreign convent exercises a certain authority over the entire house, including the guests who reside there.  An exiled Port-Royal nun should easily accept the host convent’s different material culture, even to the point of breaking the reformed Port-Royal’s vegetarianism, and different spiritual culture, including participation in a different version of the divine office than that used at Port-Royal.  Even here, however, a strict silence should be employed to avoid any moral cooperation with Port-Royal’s persecutors.  If an exiled nun confesses her sin to the convent’s confessor, she should not reveal anything else in her conscience except her sins, soberly described.  Interviews with the new superior should be respectful but the exiled nun should not reveal her internal state of mind.  An asceticism of the tongue is essential in this genteel campaign of resistance.

The abbess also reminds the nuns of the virtues they need to cultivate during the impending persecution.  They need to acquire the virtues of the martyrs who have preceded them.  “God clearly permits us to be consoled by the thought that we are suffering because we feared to offend him by assenting against our conscience to something we thought impossible to do without attacking the truth [CC, 104].”  In refusing to assent to the condemnation of what they believed to be Jansen’s accurate theory of grace, the nuns have become the most modern of victims: the martyr to conscience.

The persecution also gives the nuns the occasion to deepen the virtues of humility and of dependence on God’s providence.  Most strikingly, the deprivation of Holy Communion (as part of the censure of interdict) permits the nuns to discover an asacramental type of communion with Christ that seems to transcend the value of sacramental communion.  “Instead of the bread of God, we receive the word of God himself, which must be heard in our heart….We place our confidence in the promise made to us in Holy Scripture that the spiritual anointing, even greater in affliction, will teach us everything [CC, 95].” Under the brunt of persecution, the piety of the nun becomes a comparatively antinomian type of piety, no longer requiring the sacramental or sacerdotal meditation of the church to experience intimate communion with God.

4. Interpretation and Relevance

Several factors have limited the reception and interpretation of the works of Mère Agnès Arnauld as properly philosophical works.  First, a number of secondary works have focused exclusively on the controversy over the nun’s early pamphlet Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament. The commentaries by Saint-Cyran (1633), Binet (1635), Armogathe (1991), and Lesaulnier (1994) indicate the longstanding interest in the church-state controversy behind this international quarrel.  This focus on the ecclesiastical politics behind the abbess’s early work has tended to devalorize the more detailed positions on virtue and authority developed by Mère Agnès in her works of maturity.  Second, the Jansenist movement itself often distanced itself from the works of the nun, considered too mystical for the practical, rationalist piety of the Jansenist mainstream.  Barcos’s (1696) critique of Mère Agnès’s theories of prayer indicates the disdain of the later Jansenist movement for a mysticism-oriented philosophy too dependent on its Oratorian sources.

The contemporary philosophical retrieval of the thought of Mère Agnès is focusing more on her work as a moralist.  Her virtue theory privileges those intellectual and volitional habits that typify the way of life proper to a strictly cloistered convent.  Contemplation itself, interpreted as a loving gaze on God freed from all self-interest, becomes the keystone of the authentic virtuous life.  As Mesnard (1994) argues, the more active dimension of the life of the embattled nun merits new consideration.  Her reflections on the quandaries of material cooperation with evil constitute a casuistry for the oppressed.  The ethics of resistance she constructed during the persecution of Port-Royal remains to be explored.

5. References and Further Reading

All translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Avis donnés par la Mère Cathérine Agnès de Saint-Paul, Sur la conduite que les   religieuses doivent garder, au cas qu’il arrivât du changement dans le gouvernement de sa maison (N.p.: 1718).
    • [The treatise analyzes the morality of material cooperation with the opponents of the convent.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Counsels on the Conduct Which the Nuns Should Maintain in the Event of a Change in the Governance of the Convent.1718.
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. L’image d’une religieuse parfait et d’une imparfaite, avec les occupations intérieures pour toute la journée (Paris: Charles Savreux, 1665.)
    • [This work analyzes the difference between theocentric and anthropocentric virtue, with the accent placed on the Oratorian virtue of self-annihilation.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Les constitutions du monastère de Port-Royal du Saint-Sacrement (Mons: Gaspard Migeot, 1665.)
    • [Written with the collaboration of Antoine Arnauld and Mère Angélique Arnauld, this juridical document provides the legal framework for the reformed Port-Royal convent.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Lettres de la Mère Agnès Arnauld, abbesse de Port-Royal, ed. Prosper Faugère [and Rachel Galet], 2 vols. (Paris: Benjamin Duprat, 1858).
    • [The correspondence indicates the broad Augustinian culture of the abbess as well as the principles of her methods of governance and of spiritual direction.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Private Chaplet of the Blessed Sacrament (1626).
  • Arnauld, Mère Agnès. Spirit of Port-Royal (1665).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Armogathe, Robert. “Le chapelet secret de Mère Agnès Arnauld,” XVIIe siècle no. 170 (1990): 77-86.
    • [The article provides an excellent critical edition of the Private Chaplet and an analysis of the work’s theology of rupture.]
  • Barcos, Martin de. Les sentiments de l’abbé Philérème sur l’oraison mentale (Cologne: P. Du Marteau, 1696).
    • [The Jansenist leader criticizes Mère Agnès’s approach to meditation as too methodical and too intellectualist.]
  • Binet, Étienne. Discussion sommaire d’un livret intitulé “Le chapelet secret du très-saint Sacrement” (Paris: 1635).
    • [The Jesuit author criticizes Mère Agnès’s Private Chaplet for its alleged asacramentalism and discouragement of the cultivation of the moral virtues.]
  • Bugnion-Sécretan, Perle. Mère Agnès Arnauld, 1593-1672; Abbesse de Port-Royal. (Paris: Cerf, 1996).
    • [This biography uses Mère Agnès’s correspondence to probe the abbess’s psychological life.]
  • Conley, John J. Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Port-Royal (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Pres, 2009): 113-174.
    • [This chapter analyzes Mère Agnès’s Augustinian philosophy, especially its theory of virtue, freedom, and the divine attributes.]
  • Chédozeau, Bernard. “Aux sources du Traité de l’oraison de Pierre Nicole: Martin de Barcos et Jean Desmarets de Saint-Sorlin lecteurs des Occupations intérieures de la Mère Agnès Arnauld,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 43 (1994): 123-34.
    • [The article traces the influence of Mère Agnès’s spirituality on subsequent controversies over the nature of Christian contemplation.]
  • Desmarets de Saint-Sorlin, Jean. Le chemin de la paix et celui de l’inquiétude, vol. 1 (Paris: C. Audinet, 1665).
    • [The book condemns Mère Agnès’s theories of prayer as too rationalistic.]
  • Lesaulnier, Jean. “Le chapelet secret de la Mère Agnès Arnauld,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 43 (1994): 9-23.
    • [The article provides a well-documented textual study of the various versions of and controversy over the abbess’s Private Chaplet.]
  • Mesnard, Jean. “Mère Agnès femme d’action,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 43 (1994): 57-80.
    • [Unlike other commentators, the author stresses the practical rather than the mystical dimension of Mère Agnès’s work and theories.]
  • Nicole, Pierre de. Traité de l’oraison (Paris: H. Josset, 1679).
    • [A leading Jansenist philosopher defends Mère Agnés’s spirituality as both doctrinally orthodox and philosophically sound.]
  • Saint-Cyran, Jean du Vergier de Haurranne, abbé de. Examen d’une apologie qui a été faite pour server de défense à un petit livre intitulé Le chapelet secret du Très-Saint Sacrement (Paris, 1633).
    • [A defense of the Augustinian pedigree and orthodoxy of Mère Agnès’s Private Chaplet, the work marked Saint-Cyran’s inaugural alliance with the convent of Port-Royal.]
  • Timmermans, Linda. “La ‘Religieuse Parfaite’ et la théologie: L’attitude de la Mère Agnès à l’égard de la participation aux controverses,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 43 (1994): 97-112.
    • [The commentary on Image of a Perfect Nun argues that the abbess desired nuns to abstain from theological disputes; Mère Agnès’s own participation in several such public disputes is downplayed.]
  • Weaver, F. Ellen. La Contre-Réforme et les constitutions de Port-Royal (Paris: Cerf, 2002.)
    • [This study stresses the link between the abbess’s vision of reformed conventual life and both the earlier Cistercian tradition and other “non-Jansenist” currents in the Counter-Reformation.]

Author Information

John J. Conley
Email: jconley1@loyola.edu
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.