It is widely thought that the capacity of artworks to arouse emotions in audiences is a perfectly natural and unproblemmatic fact. It just seems obvious that we can feel sadness or pity for fictional characters, fear at the view of threatening monsters on the movie screen, and joy upon listening to upbeat, happy songs. This may be why so many of us are consumers of art in the first place. Good art, many of us tend to think, should not leave us cold.
These common thoughts, however natural they are become problematic once we start to make explicit other common ideas about both emotion and our relationship with artworks. If some emotions, such as pity, require that the object of the emotion be believed to exist, even though it actually doesn’t, how would it then be possible to feel pity for a fictional character that we all know does not exist? A task of fundamental importance, therefore, is to explain the possibility of emotion in the context of our dealings with various kinds of artworks.
How are we motivated to pursue, and find value in, an emotional engagement with artworks when much of this includes affective states that we generally count as negative or even painful (fear, sadness, anger, and so on)? If we would rather avoid feeling these emotions in real life, how are we to explain cases where we pursue activities, such as watching films, that we know may arouse similar feelings? Alternatively, why are so many people eager to listen to seemingly deeply distressing musical works when they would not want to feel this way in other contexts? Are most of us guilty of irrational pleasure in liking what makes us feel bad? Answering these and related questions is of prime importance if we wish to vindicate the thought that emotion in response to art is not only a good thing to have, but also valuable in enabling us to appreciate artworks.
That emotion is a central part of our dealings with artworks seems undeniable. Yet, natural ideas about emotion, at least taken collectively, make it hard to see why such an assumption should be true. Once we know a bit more about emotion, it isn’t clear how we could feel genuine emotion towards artworks in the first place. Furthermore, if it were possible to find a plausible theory of emotion that would vindicate the claim that we experience genuine emotion towards artworks, questions arise as to why most of us are motivated to engage in artworks, especially when these tend to produce negative emotions. How can the emotion we feel towards artworks be rationally justified? Overall, a proper understanding of our emotional responses to art should shed light on its value.
Although the general question of what an emotion consists in is highly debated, it is nonetheless possible to address a list of fairly uncontroversial general features of emotions that are most relevant to the present discussion.
Cognitive thesis: Emotions are cognitive states in the sense that they purport to be about things in the world. This means they require objects, they have intentionality, and they ascribe certain properties to them. For instance, fear can be thought to be attributed to an object’s dangerous nature or quality. Given that emotions are representational states, they are subject to norms of correctness. A case of fear is inappropriate if the object is not in fact dangerous or threatening. The nature of the relevant state─whether it is a judgment, a perception, or something else─is a matter of debate (see Deonna & Teroni, 2012, for an excellent introduction). Depending on the answer one gives on this issue, one’s views on the nature of our affective states towards artworks may differ.
Belief requirement: Even though emotions are probably not belief-states, they may always depend on beliefs for their existence and justification. One cannot, it seems, grieve over someone’s death if one doesn’t believe that they actually died. Or one cannot hope that it will be sunny tomorrow if one believes that the world is going to end tonight. More relevantly for the rest of the discussion, it may be difficult to make sense of why someone is genuinely afraid of something that does not exist.
Phenomenological thesis: Emotions are typically felt. There is something it is like to be experiencing an emotion; they are ‘qualitative’ states). Moreover, emotions are experienced with various levels of intensity. Sometimes it is possible to be in a situation where a given emotion is experienced at a high/low level of intensity where a higher/lower level is considered appropriate, suggesting that the correctness conditions of emotion should include a condition to the effect that the emotion is appropriately proportionate to its object.
Valence thesis: Emotions have valence or hedonic tone. Their phenomenology is such that some of them are experienced as negative and some as positive. Some emotion types seem to be essentially positive or negative. For example, fear, sadness, and pity are paradigmatic negative emotions, whereas joy and admiration are paradigmatic positive emotions.
All of these features, taken either individually or in combination, raise issues with respect to the alleged emotional relationship we entertain with artworks. Here are a couple of examples. The cognitive thesis and belief requirement make it difficult to see how our affective responses to things we believe to be non-existent, or to strings of meaningless (without representational content) sounds─as in instrumental music─could be genuine emotions. Alternatively, they require us to give a cogent account of the objects of the relevant emotions if these are to count as genuine. The valence thesis, combined with the plausible claim that ‘negative’ emotions are frequently felt in response to artworks, raise the question of how we can be motivated to pursue an engagement with artworks that we know are likely to arouse painful experiences in us. Finally, if the claims that we experience genuine emotions towards artworks, and that we are not irrational in seeking out unpleasant experiences, can be made good, the question whether these emotional responses themselves are rational, justified, or proportional remains to be answered.
Artworks can be roughly divided into those that are representational and those that are non-representational or abstract. Examples of the former include works of fiction, landscape paintings and pop music songs. Examples of the latter include expressionist paintings and works of instrumental or absolute music. Both kinds of artworks are commonly thought to arouse affective responses in audiences. The basic question is how best to describe such responses.
Starting with representational artworks, it isn’t clear how we can undergo genuine emotional responses towards things we believe not to exist in the first place (creating a tension with the belief requirement above). Taking the case of fiction as a paradigm case, we seem to come to the following paradox (first formulated by Radford, 1975):
Claims (1)-(3) being inconsistent, most theorists have tried to solve the paradox of fiction by rejecting one or more of these premises.
The fictional emotions condition (claim (1)) can be denied in two main ways. On the one hand, one could deny that the affective states we experience in the context of an encounter with fiction are genuine emotions. On the other hand, accepting that the affective states in question are genuine emotions, one could deny that such mental states are in fact directed at fictional characters and situations.
Regardless of how the debate over the nature of our affective responses to fiction turns out, one thing is clear: we can be moved by an encounter with fiction. It is difficult to deny that works of fiction tend to affect us in some way or other. One solution to the paradox of fiction is therefore to claim that the relevant affective states need not be genuine emotions but affective states of some other kind (for example, Charlton, 1970, 97). Some affective states or moods (like cheerfulness) and, perhaps, reflex-like reactions (surprise and shock), do not seem to require existential beliefs in order to occur and are in fact compatible with the presence of beliefs with any given content. There is certainly no contradiction in a state of mind involving both a gloomy mood and the belief that the characters described in fiction are purely fictional. An advantage of this view is that it explains why the responses we have towards fiction are very much emotion-like. Moods, for instance, are not typically ‘cold’ mental states but have a phenomenal character.
The major difficulty with approaches appealing to such seemingly non-cognitive or non-intentional states is that they only seem to account for a small part of the full range of affective states we experience in response to fiction (Levinson, 1997, 23, Neill, 1991, 55). It is quite clear that many of the affective states we have in response to fiction are experienced as directed towards some object or other. One’s sadness upon seeing a story’s main character die is, at the very least, felt as directed towards someone, be it the character himself, a real-world analogue of himself (for instance, a best friend), or any other known reference. An adequate solution to the paradox of fiction, therefore, should allow the affective states one feels in response to fiction to be genuinely intentional.
Another solution that denies that we experience genuine emotions towards fictional characters is the one given by Kendal Walton (1978). According to Walton, it is not literally true that we experience pity for the fictional character Anna Karenina, and it is not literally true that we experience fear at the view of the approaching green slime on the movie screen. Rather, we are in some sense pretending to be experiencing such emotions. It is only fictionally the case that we feel pity or fear in such contexts. As a result, the affective states we actually experience are not genuine emotions, but what Walton calls ‘quasi-emotions’. Just as one makes-believe that the world is infested with heartless zombies when watching Night of the Living Dead, or that one is reading the diary of Robinson Crusoe, one only makes-believe that one feels fear for the survivors, or sadness when Crusoe is having a bad day. Watching films and reading novels turn out very much like children’s games where objects are make-believedly taken to be something else (for example, children pretend to bake cookies using cakes of mud). In engaging with both fiction and children’s games, for Walton, we can only be pretending to be experiencing emotion.
Walton does not deny that we are genuinely moved by─or emotionally involved with─the world of fiction; he only denies that such affective states are of the garden-variety, that they should be described as genuine states of fear, pity, anger, and so on. This denial is backed up by two main arguments. First, in contrast with real-life emotions, quasi-emotions are typically not connected to behavior. We, indeed, do not get up on the theater stage in order to warn Romeo that he is about to make a terrible mistake. Second, in line with the belief requirement, Walton appeals to what seems to him a “principle of commonsense”, “one which ought not to be abandoned if there is any reasonable alternative, that fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger.” (1978, 6-7)
Walton’s theory can be attacked on several fronts, but the most common strategy is to reject one or both of the arguments Walton gives. In response to the first argument, one could argue that emotions in general are not necessarily connected to motivation or behavior. For instance, emotions directed at the past, such as regret, are not typically associated with any particular sort of behavior. Of course, emotions can lead to behavior, and many of them include a motivational component, but it is not clear that such a component is a defining feature of emotion in general. Moreover, it is important to note that most works of fiction are composed of representations of certain events, and do not purport to create the illusion that we are in direct confrontation with them. The most natural class of real-world emotions comparable to the relevant affective states, is therefore, emotions experienced towards representations of real-world states of affairs (documentaries and newspapers), and not in contexts of direct confrontation with the relevant objects. Once this distinction─between emotion in response to direct confrontation and emotion in response to representations of real-world events─is made, it becomes apparent that the lack of distinctive behavioral tendencies in affective states produced by fiction should not count against the claim that they constitute genuine emotions. Assuming the claim that it is possible to feel genuine pity, sadness or anger upon reading or hearing the report of a true story, the relevant emotions need not, and typically do not, include a motivational component whose aim is to modify the world in some way. One can read the story of a Jewish family deported in the 1940’s, feel deep sadness in response to it, yet lack the desires to act, as in sadness that is evoked in contexts of direct confrontation. (See Matravers, 1998, Ch. 4, for elaboration.)
The second argument, relying on (something like) the belief requirement, can be rejected by denying the requirement itself. A reason in favor of rejecting the belief requirement instead of the fictional emotions conditions is that rejecting the latter leads to a view with the highly revisionary consequence that it is never the case that we respond to fictions with genuine emotion. This sort of strategy will be introduced in Section 2.b.
If one accepts the claim that fiction can trigger genuine emotions in audiences, but nonetheless does not wish to reject either the belief requirement or the disbelief condition, one can deny that the relevant emotions are directed at fictional entities in the first place. An alternative way to describe our emotions in response to fiction is to say that, although such emotions are caused by fictional entities, they are not directed at them. As Gregory Currie summarizes what is sometimes called the ‘counterpart theory’ (defended in, for instance, Weston, 1975 and Paskins, 1977),
…we experience genuine emotions when we encounter fiction, but their relation to the story is causal rather than intentional; the story provokes thoughts about real people and situations, and these are the intentional objects of our emotions. (1990, 188)
Given that the objects of the relevant emotions─particular people and situations, types of people and situations, the fictional work itself, certain real-world properties inspired by the fictional characters, as well as real human potentialities (Mannison, 1985)─both exist and are believed to exist, the view satisfies the belief requirement. In addition, the view is compatible with the plausible claim that we do not believe in the existence of fictional characters and situations (that is, the disbelief condition). Appealing to surrogate objects is in fact a way to do justice to it.
Despite its elegance and simplicity, this solution to the paradox of fiction does not find a lot of proponents. It manages to capture some of the affective states, but not all. More specifically, the example of appealing to objectless affective states, fails to capture those affective states that are experienced as directed at the fictional characters and situations themselves. To many philosophers, it is simply a datum of the phenomenology of our responses to fiction that these are sometimes directed at the characters and situations themselves. It is precisely these responses that initially called for explanation.
"For we do not really weep for the pain that a real person might suffer”, says Colin Radford, “and which real persons have suffered, when we weep for Anna Karenina, even if we should not be moved by her story if it were not of that sort. We weep for her." (Radford, 1975, 75) An adequate theory of our emotional responses to fiction that appeals to surrogate objects, as a result, owes us an account of why we may be mistaken in thinking otherwise.
The rejection of the claim that we can respond to fictional characters and situations with genuine emotions, and that such emotions can be genuinely directed at the latter, seems to clash with a rather stable commitment of commonsense. In recent years, the dominant approach has rather been to reject the belief requirement (claim (2)).
One reason why one might deny that the affective states we have in response to fiction are genuine emotions is an acceptance, explicit or implicit, of a certain theory of emotion. According to the so-called ‘cognitive’ theory of emotion (sometimes called ‘judgmentalism’), an emotion necessarily involves the belief or judgment that the object of the emotion instantiates a certain evaluative property (see examples in Lyons, 1980. Solomon, 1993). In this view, an episode of fear would necessarily involve the belief or judgment that one is in danger. This resembles the ‘principle of commonsense’ that Walton speaks of when he claims that “fear must be accompanied by, or must involve, a belief that one is in danger” (1978, 6-7). If emotions are, or necessarily involve, evaluative beliefs about the actual, it is no wonder that they require existential beliefs. The belief that a given big dog constitutes a threat, for instance, seems to entail the belief that the dog exists. Rejecting the cognitive theory, as a result, may seem to be a way to cast doubt on the belief requirement.
The cognitive theory of emotion is widely rejected for well-known reasons. One of them is the counterintuitive consequence that one would be guilty of a radical form of irrationality every time one’s emotions turn out to conflict with one’s judgments, as in cases of phobic fears (Tappolet, 2000, Döring, 2009). Another reason to reject the cognitive theory is that it may lead to the denial that human infants and non-human animals cannot experience emotions, since they plausibly lack the necessary level of cognitive sophistication (Deigh, 1994). Ultimately, many people seem to think, the theory is too ‘intellectualist’ to be plausible (Goldie, 2000, Robinson, 2005).
It is one thing to reject the cognitive theory of emotion, however, quite another to reject the belief requirement. Although the two views are closely related and are often held together (since the cognitive theory implies the belief requirement, at least understood as a requirement of rationality─see below), the falsity of the cognitive theory does not entail the falsity of the belief requirement. What the latter says is that, no matter how an emotion is to be ultimately defined, the having of one requires that the subject believe that its object exists. As Levinson says,
The sticking point of the paradox of fiction is the dimension of existence and nonexistence, as this connects to the cognitive characterization that emotions of the sort in question minimally require. When we view or conceive an object as having such and such properties, whether or not we strictly believe that it does, we must, on pain of incoherence, be taking said object to exist or be regarding it as existence. For nothing can coherently be viewed or conceived as having properties without at the same time being treated as existent. (1997, 24-25)
It is a mistake, therefore, to think that a simple rejection of the cognitive theory of emotion can solve the paradox of fiction. What one must do is confront the belief requirement directly.
The main way to challenge the belief requirement is to claim that, although our emotional responses to events in the world require the presence of some cognitive states, such states need not be beliefs. On such a view, sometimes called the “thought theory” (Lamarque, 1981, Carroll, 1990), one need not believe that an object O exists in order to be afraid of it; rather, one must at least entertain the thought that O exists (Carroll, 1990, 80), or imagine what O would be like if it existed (Novitz, 1980), or ‘alieve’ O being a certain way (see Gendler, 2008, for the distinction between alief and belief). We surely are capable of responding emotionally as a result of thought processes that fall short of belief, as when we are standing near a precipice and entertaining the thought that we may fall over (Carroll, 1990, 80. Robinson, 2005).
Thoughts, according to Lamarque and Carroll, can generate genuine emotions. On their view, the vivid imagining of one’s lover’s death can produce genuine sadness. It is important, however, to note that what the emotion is about─its intentional object─is not the thought itself, but what the thought is about (its ‘content’). In the case just given, one’s sadness is about one’s lover’s death, and not about the thought that one’s lover may die. Here, as in many everyday instances of emotion, the cause of one’s emotion need not coincide with its object, and the object of one’s emotion need not exist. As a result, the view preserves the claim that we can have genuine emotions directed towards fictional characters and situations.
Despite the fact that the thought theory (and its cognates─for example, Gendler’s view) enjoys a great deal of plausibility, in that it meshes quite well with recent orthodoxy in both the philosophy and the psychology of emotion in its claim that existential beliefs are not necessary for emotion in general (for a review, see Deonna & Teroni, 2012). It nonetheless appears to naturally lead to the claim that there is something utterly irrational, unreasonable, or otherwise wrong, in feeling fear, pity, joy, grief, and so on, both in response to mere thoughts, and for things that we know not to exist. If feeling pity for a fictional character is like feeling fear while imagining the possible crash of the plane one is taking (assuming flying the plane is a perfectly safe activity and one knows it), it becomes hard to see how one can be said to be rational in engaging emotionally with fiction, perhaps even to see where the value of doing so could lie. See Section 5 below.
When first presenting the paradox of fiction, Colin Radford decided to accept all the three premises of the alleged paradox and declared us ‘irrational’ in being moved by fiction. If one interprets the paradox as a logical paradox, that is as one in which the claims cannot all be true, then one would be led to the unpalatable thought that the world in itself includes some form of incoherence (Yanal, 1994). A more reasonable way to understand Radford’s decision to accept the three premises of the paradox, and in turn to declare us irrational, is to say that, as he understands them, they are not really inconsistent (they in fact can all be true). What interests Radford may not be so much how it is possible for audiences to feel emotions in response to fiction (although he must presuppose an answer to that question) than how it is possible for us to feel such emotions and be rational in doing so. An alternative way to read the belief requirement is, therefore, as a norm of rationality (Joyce, 2000). On such a reading, in order for an emotion to be fully appropriate or rational, it is necessary that the subject believe that the emotion’s object exists. A child’s fear of monsters in his bed at night may be irrational if the child does not believe that monsters in fact exist. Our emotional responses to fiction, although genuine, may be akin to such irrational fears of unreal entities.
It remains to be seen whether the belief requirement formulated as a norm of rationality (of a sort to be elucidated) is acceptable in the context of emotion in general, and in the context of emotion in response to artworks in particular. (See Section 5 below for further details.)
Among all the strategies that have been adopted in response to the paradox of fiction, the least popular is the one that rejects the disbelief condition. There are two main ways to reject this condition.
The first way to reject the disbelief condition is to claim that, while watching films and reading novels, we are in some way under the illusion that the characters and situations depicted in them are real and we willfully suspend our disbelief in their existence (Coleridge, 1817), or simply forget, temporarily, that they do not exist.
The main problem with this solution is the notable behavioral differences between real-world responses and responses to fiction. If we were really suspending our disbelief we would behave differently than we actually do in our dealings with fictions. Another problem is the notion that we can suspend our disbelief at will in the context of fiction, seems to presuppose a capacity of voluntary control over our beliefs in the face of opposing evidence - a claim that surely needs a proper defense. See Doxastic Voluntarism, and Carroll, 1990, Ch.2, for further discussion. Finally, it may be partly due to the fact that we are aware that we are dealing with fiction that we can find pleasure, or some worth, in experiencing negative emotions towards fictional entities in the first place. (See section on Art and Negative Emotion: The Paradox of Tragedy.)
Currie (1990, 10) provides an alternative understanding of the notion of willful suspension of disbelief whereby it is occurrent, as opposed to dispositional disbelief that should be suppressed. What suspension of disbelief requires, for Currie, is merely that one, while engaged in a work of fiction, does not attend to the fact that the story is literally false. On such a view, a proper engagement with fictional stories, while allowing one to believe at some level that these stories are non-actual requires that one not bring this belief to consciousness. This solution, however, remains rather sketchy and may need to be supplemented with further details about the workings of the relevant mechanism. See Todd, forthcoming, for a proposal (in particular for the notion of bracketed beliefs).
The second way to reject the disbelief condition is by arguing that in some sense we do actually believe what the relevant stories tell us (rather than merely suspend our disbelief in the reality of their content), and therefore that the characters at play in them exist in some way. A plausible way to do so is to say that beliefs need not be directed at propositions about the actual and sometimes can be directed at propositions about what is fictionally the case. For instance, there does not seem to be anything wrong with the utterance “I believe that Sherlock Holmes lives in London”, and with the possibility of a genuine disagreement between the speaker and someone who believes that Holmes lives in Manchester. The fact that the relevant states are about a fictional entity does not give us a reason to deny them the status of beliefs. According to Alex Neill (1993), many of the types of emotion (pity, for example) we experience in response to fiction, require the presence of certain beliefs while leaving open the ontological status (actual vs. non-actual) of the entities involved in its content. On this account, what matters for pity, for instance, is not that a given character is believed to have actually existed, but that she is having a miserable time (in the fiction).
Whether an appeal to belief (as opposed to an appeal to make-beliefs, imaginings, attention mechanisms, and so on.) is the right way to capture the phenomenon is open for debate. Still, this solution not only seems to accommodate some of our intuitions, but also prompts us to further investigate the nature of the kinds of belief, if any, found in the context of an engagement with works of fiction. See Suits (2006) for further discussion.
Representational artworks are not the only ones capable of eliciting affective states in audiences; non-representational artworks can do so, too. One surely can be moved by a Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony or a Jackson Pollock’s No.5, 1948. A problem analogous to the problem of fiction can however be found in the case of abstract art. How can it be the case that we are moved by strings of sounds, or configurations of colors, when such entities do not represent anything, strictly speaking? Here, the question of what is the object of the relevant emotions is even more pressing than for fiction, as in this case there seems to be no characters and situations for an emotion to be about. Focusing on the case of (instrumental or absolute) music, two main questions should therefore be addressed. First, how should we classify our affective responses to music? Second, if such affective responses can be genuine emotions, what are their objects?
As in the case of fiction, there are affective responses to music that may not pose any substantial philosophical problem. Such responses include seemingly non-cognitive or non-intentional states such as moods and feelings. Since moods are not directed at anything in particular, and can be triggered by a variety of things, including events, thoughts, and even certain chemical substances (such as caffeine), they do not constitute a problem in the context of our dealings with musical works. However, can genuine emotions be experienced in response to music? Intuitively, the answer is ‘of course’. The problem is precisely what kinds of emotion these can be and towards what they can be directed.
Some cases of genuine emotion in response to music that do not seem to be philosophically significant, moreover, are those emotions that we experience in response to music which can be explained by idiosyncratic facts about the subject. This is what Peter Kivy calls the ‘our-song phenomenon’ (Kivy, 1999, 4). A piece of music, for instance, may bring to one a host of memories that produce sadness. Here, as elsewhere, the intentional object of the emotion turns out not to be the music itself but what the memories are about (a lost love, say). Such cases are not philosophically puzzling, therefore, because they involve emotions whose object is not (or at least not exclusively) the music or the music’s properties.
Alternatively, one may fear that the loudness of a performance of Vivaldi’s Four Seasons might cause severe auditory damage. In such a case, although the music is the object of the emotion, the emotion is not in any way aesthetically relevant. It is not a response that is made appropriate by the music’s aesthetic properties. Furthermore, it is not a response that everyone is expected to experience in response to Vivaldi’s piece, as opposed to the particular performance of it in a specific context. (By analogy, one may be angry at the sight of a stain on the frame of the Mona Lisa; this, however, does not make anger an appropriate response to the painting as an object of aesthetic appraisal.)
What we need to know is whether there are cases of emotion that can claim to be aesthetically relevant in this intuitive way.
It is commonly thought that musical works can be ‘sad’, ‘happy’, ‘melancholy’, perhaps even ‘angry’. In short, music appears capable of expressing, or being expressive of, emotions. One line of thought is that, just as we can respond to human expressions of emotion with genuine emotions, we can respond to music’s expressive properties with genuine emotions. In the case of human expressions of emotion, one can for instance react to someone’s sadness with genuine sadness, pity, or anger, the person (or the person’s distress) being the intentional object of one’s emotion. Likewise, if music can express sadness, one may respond to it by being sad (Davies, 1994, 279), something that seems to accord with common experience. The problem, of course, is in what sense music can be said to ‘express’ emotion in a way that would cause appropriate corresponding emotions in audiences. (The addition of the word ‘appropriate’ here is important, as one could agree that the relevant properties sometimes cause emotion─just as any (concrete) object can happen to cause emotion─but nonetheless consider them irrelevant to a proper appreciation of the work. For the view that all emotion elicited by musical works is pure distraction, see Zangwill, 2004.)
Of course, it is one thing to ask what musical expressiveness consists in; it is another thing to wonder about the nature of our affective response to musical works. One question addresses what makes it the case that a piece of music can be said to be ‘sad’, ‘joyful’ or ‘melancholy’, the other asks what makes it the case that we can feel emotions, if any, in response to a piece of music. As a result, nothing prevents one from answering these questions separately. Nevertheless, the various answers one might give to the question about musical expressiveness plausibly can have implications regarding the nature and appropriateness of our emotional responses to music’s expressive properties. If, for instance, the answer we give is that music can express emotions in roughly the same way humans do, then we are likely to count experiences of sadness in response to ‘sad’ music as appropriate. If, by contrast, we take the answer to be that music is expressive in an analogous way colors and masks can be expressive, we are likely to consider the affective states the relevant features tend to trigger either inappropriate (when feeling sadness directed at a work’s ‘sadness’) or of a sort that we don’t typically find in our responses to paradigmatic expression of human emotion.
Let’s call the claim according to which it is appropriate to react emotionally to music’s expressive properties in an analogous way it is appropriate to react emotionally to the expression of other people’s emotions, the expression-emotion link thesis (E), and the sorts of responses we typically (and appropriately) experience in response to the expression of human emotions─such as pity, sadness, compassion, or sympathy when someone is in a state of distress─‘empathetic emotions’. Accounts of musical expressiveness divide into those that naturally lead to the acceptance of (E) and those that naturally lead to its rejection (and perhaps to the denial that empathetic emotions are ever really felt in the context of an engagement with musical works).
The most obvious way to do justice to the thought that music’s expressiveness can appropriately arouse in its audience emotions that are analogous to those one would feel in response to a real person expressing her emotions is to say that music itself is a medium by which human emotions can express themselves. Music, on one such view, can express the emotions of the composer. So, if when we listen to music we listen to what we take to be the direct expression of the emotions of some real human being, then the usual emotions we can feel towards someone expressing emotion through facial expression, gestures, voice, and so on, are emotions we can feel in response to music. One problematic feature of this view is the highly robust link it makes between the mental states of the artist and the expressive properties of the music he or she produces. Little reflection suggests that it is just not true that whenever a musical work is ‘cheerful’, its composer was cheerful when composing it; a sad composer could have created the work just as well. Moreover, the view does not seem to do justice to our experience of musical works, as we typically do not, and need not, construe them as expressions of human emotion in order to be moved by them; our experience of musical works does not typically go beyond the sounds themselves, and probably not to the artist who produced them.
One way to preserve the attractive thought that music can genuinely express emotions, and therefore that it may sometimes be appropriate to respond to it with empathetic emotions, is to claim that music can express emotion, not by virtue of it being produced by an artist experiencing emotion, but imagined as something or someone that expresses emotion. According to Jerrold Levinson (1990), when we listen to music that is expressive of emotion, we hear it as though someone─what he calls the music’s ‘persona’─were expressing the emotion of the music. Of course, the persona is not something that is or ought to be imagined in great detail; for instance, there is no need to attribute any specific physical characteristics to it. All that is needed is that something very much human-like be imagined as expressing human-like emotions. Now, if Levinson is right in claiming that music’s expressive properties are to be explained by an appeal to a persona that we imagine to be in the music, then there is less mystery in the possibility for audiences to experience genuine emotions in response to these properties. At the very least, there may be here as much mystery as in our ability to experience genuine emotions in response to the expression of emotion by fictional characters, and the solution one gives to the paradox of fiction may as a result be expandable so as to include the case of music. See Kivy, 2002, 116-117, for doubts about this strategy.
Regardless of the appeal of its conclusions, the persona theory relies on a psychological mechanism─imagining hearing a persona in the music─whose nature may need to be further clarified (see Davies, 1997, for problems for the persona account). An account of music’s expressive properties that posits no seemingly mysterious mechanism, and therefore that may seem less controversial, is what is sometimes called the ‘contour’ or ‘resemblance’ theory (examples can be found in Davies, 1994, Kivy, 1989). According to this view, music can be expressive of emotion in virtue of resembling characteristic expressions of human emotion, a resemblance that we seem pretty good at picking out. A heavy, slow-paced piece of music may, for instance, resemble the way a sad, depressed person would walk and behave, and it may be why we are tempted to call it ‘sad’ or ‘depressing’ in the first place. Musical works, on such a view, are analogous to colors, masks, and other things that we may call ‘happy’, ‘sad’, and so on, on the basis of their perceptible properties. A ‘happy’ song is similar to a smiling mask in that they both resemble in some way characteristic behavioral expressions of human emotion.
The contour theorist does not claim that music genuinely expresses emotion in the way that paradigmatically humans do (that is, by first experiencing an emotion, and then expressing it); rather, she claims that music can resemble expressions of human emotion, just as certain other objects can. Given that musical expressiveness is, on this view, different from paradigmatic human expression, we are led to conclude one of two claims: either the emotions we typically experience in response to music’s expressive properties are generally not of the same sort as the emotions we typically experience in response to other people’s expressions of emotion, or, whenever they are, they are inappropriate. The former claim is a descriptive claim about the nature of our emotional responses to music’s expressive properties; the latter claim is a normative claim about the sorts of responses music’s expressive properties require, if any. We will consider the descriptive claim in the next section.
Why does the contour theory naturally lead to the normative claim? The answer is that, just as it would be inappropriate to feel ‘empathetic’ emotions in response to the sadness of a mask or the cheerfulness of a color, it would be inappropriate to feel such emotions in response to the sadness, or the cheerfulness, of a piece of music. Unless we believe that what one is sad about when looking at a mask is not really the mask, we should be puzzled by one’s response, for, after all, nobody is (actually or fictionally) sad. (Of course, the mask may produce certain moods in one; this, however, would not constitute a problem, as we have seen.) The sadness, as a result, would count as an inappropriate response to its object.
Something similar may hold in the music case. Although there may be cases where sadness is an appropriate response to a musical work’s ‘sadness’ (for idiosyncratic reasons), this may not be a response that is aesthetically appropriate, that is, appropriate given the work’s aesthetic properties. No matter how often we respond emotionally to music’s expressive properties, these ultimately may count as mere distractions (Zangwill, 2004).
The plausibility of the contour account remains to be assessed. See Robinson, 2005, Ch. 10, for a critique. See also Neill, 1995, for the possibility of a positive role for feelings in attaining a deeper understanding of music’s expressiveness.
According to Peter Kivy (1990, 1999), there is an obvious object that can produce genuine emotions in audiences, namely the music itself. On his view, in addition to moods (with qualifications─see Kivy, 2006) and idiosyncratic emotions (the our-song phenomenon), music is capable of eliciting emotions in audiences that are both genuine (not ‘quasi-emotions’), aesthetically appropriate, and of the non-empathetic sort. When one is deeply moved by a musical work, one may be moved by its beauty, complexity, subtlety, grace, and any other properties predicated by the work (including its expressive properties, construed in terms of the contour account). According to Kivy, these emotions, which can collectively be put under the label ‘being moved’, are the only ones that count as appropriate in the relevant way. Moreover, they are not the ‘empathetic’ responses that were put forward in the aforementioned accounts. When we are moved by ‘sad’ music, what may move us is how beautifully, or gracefully the music is expressive of sadness, rather than by an alleged persona we may pity. This allows Kivy to explain why we can (rightly) fail to be moved by a musical work that is surely expressive of some emotion but is at the same time mediocre, a phenomenon that is left unexplained on alternative accounts (Kivy, 1999, 12). In addition, the account explains how music can be moving even when it lacks expressive properties altogether (ibid.).
According to Kivy, we are simply mistaken when thinking that whenever we experience a genuine emotion in response to a musical work, this emotion is of the same sort as the emotions we would feel in response to the expression of emotion in other people. It is simply not true, on his account, that music’s sadness produces in audiences a state of sadness (or other empathetic emotions) whose intentional object is its expressive property (or the entity, real or imagined, that allegedly produced it). What they feel instead is an emotion that, although directed at the music’s sadness, should not be characterized as sadness but instead as ‘exhilaration’, ‘wonder’, ‘awe’, ‘enthusiasm’, and other non-empathetic emotions. Even if the emotion is felt in response to music’s sadness, and may on occasion even feel like garden-variety empathetic emotions, Kivy states that first appearances may be deceptive.
Whether Kivy’s solution to the original problem (including his rejection of (E)), and its accompanying error theory, are adequate, is a matter of significant debate. (In any case, all parties may agree that it adequately captures some emotions that we can confidently count as appropriate responses to music.)
Let’s assume that we regularly experience genuine emotions in response to fictional characters and situations, and that among the emotions we commonly experience are paradigmatic ‘negative’ emotions. (If one thinks that music can arouse such emotions as well, the following problem is a problem about music, too.) Now, to the extent that many of us are inclined to regularly pursue an engagement with works of fiction, and thereby things that tend to produce negative emotions in audiences, we have a problem in explaining how many of us could be motivated in pursuing activities that elicit in us such unpleasant states.
The paradox of tragedy (called the ‘paradox of horror’ in the specific context of horror─Carroll, 1990) arises when the three following theses are held simultaneously:
Notice that the so-called ‘paradox’ is not a formal paradox. Unless one defends a strong form of motivational hedonism─namely, the view that all we are motivated to pursue is pleasure and nothing else; see Hedonism─the fact that many of us pursue activities that produce painful experiences is not logically problematic. Rather, the problem is that of explaining why many of us are so eager to seek out an engagement with works of fiction when they know it will result in negative emotions and negative emotions are things they generally wish to avoid (all other things being equal). Alternatively, there is a problem in explaining the presence of the relevant motivation in the context of fiction when such motivation is arguably lacking in everyday life.
The solutions to the paradox of tragedy can be divided into two broad classes: those that appeal to pleasure in solving the paradox and those that appeal to entities other than pleasure.
A common way to characterize the paradox of tragedy is by asking how we can derive pleasure from artworks that tend to elicit unpleasant states in its audience. One solution is to say that the pain that may result from an engagement with fictional works is relatively insignificant or negligible. Another solution is to say that, although the pain that may result in such an engagement can be significant, it is nonetheless compensated by pleasure derived from either the work or some other source.
Various mechanisms have been postulated in the history of philosophy in order to explain how we can sometimes derive pleasure from activities, such as watching tragedies and horror films, that tend to elicit unpleasant experiences in audiences. David Hume provides one such mechanism in his famous essay ‘Of Tragedy’. According to Hume, unpleasant emotional experiences are ‘converted’ into pleasant ones in response to positive aesthetic properties of the work such as the eloquence with which the events of the narrative are depicted. One’s overall initially unpleasant emotional state is thereby converted into a pleasant emotional state thanks to the ‘predominance’ of a positive emotion.
One of the main problems with this proposal is the absence of a clear account of the mechanism by which such conversion is made (Feagin, 1983, 95). Presumably, part of the initial overall experience─the pain─is removed and replaced by another part─the pleasure. This, however, demands explanation as to how such an operation can be performed. If the operation is not that there is first a negative emotion and thereafter a positive emotion that somehow compensates for the first’s unpleasantness (which would make Hume’s view a variant of the ‘compensation’ solution; see below), then what is it precisely?
Another problem with the conversion theory is that it seems to fail to allow for cases where people are motivated to engage with works of fiction that they know will on the whole lead to more pain than pleasure, but that may still provide them with some valuable experience (Smuts, 2007, 64). (See section on Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions below.)
Hume’s theory is meant to account for the possibility of deriving pleasure from an engagement with fictional works eliciting negative emotions. This view assumes that we do tend to experience unpleasant emotions in response to fiction; it is just that the unpleasant part of the emotions is modified in the course of the engagement so as to make the overall experience a pleasant one.
An alternative way to view our engagement with works of fiction is as in fact rarely involving any significantly unpleasant states in the first place. On a recent family of solutions, it is a fact of life that we are able to enjoy, under certain conditions, putative ‘negative’ emotions. According to one version of this solution, the ‘control theory’ (Eaton, 1982, Morreall, 1985), the relevant conditions are those where we enjoy some suitable degree of control over the situation to which we are attending. The thought is that, whenever we think that the situation is one over which we can have a fair degree of control, the negative emotions that we may feel in response to it would be felt as less painful than they would otherwise be. For instance, the fear that a professional mountain climber, a skydiver, a roller-coaster user, or a horror film lover, may feel, may be painful to such an insignificant extent that it may turn out to be enjoyable. The reason why the relevant experiences are enjoyable, on this view, is that the subjects are confident that they can handle the situation appropriately. In the fictional case, one can certainly leave the movie theater, or close the book, at any time, and therefore stop being confronted with the work, whenever it becomes unbearable (for example, when it depicts extreme violence).
One worry with the present solution is that, in its current form at least, it still leaves it rather mysterious why we are able to derive pleasure from even mildly unpleasant affective states. The control theorist does not deny that the relevant emotions are to some degree unpleasant. The problem is that she fails to provide us with an account as to why we would want to have such experiences in the first place. What’s so enjoyable about feeling a little pain? As Aaron Smuts puts it, “If we feel any pain at all, then the question of why we desire such experiences, why we seek out painful art, is still open.” (Smuts, 2007, 66)
Another worry is that the view may not have the resources to explain why some people, and not others, pursue activities that tend to elicit unpleasant experiences, when everyone enjoys the relevant control (Gaut, 1993, 338). The fact that people have some control over their responses may well be a prerequisite for the possibility of finding pleasure in them, but it does not seem to explain why such pleasure is to be had in the first place. As alternatively put, although confidence that one will have the capacity to exercise some degree of control may be necessary in order to have the relevant motivation, it is surely insufficient. The control theory therefore requires further elaboration.
One way to solve the paradox of tragedy by relying on the idea that we can enjoy negative emotions is by denying an assumption that was made when we initially posed the problem, namely that the ‘negative’ emotions we feel in response to fiction are necessarily unpleasant states (Walton, 1990, Neill, 1993). One problem with control theories, we saw, is that they fail to explain why we should even enjoy mild instances of pain. The present solution, by contrast, does not claim that the emotions we experience involve any such pain. More generally, the view denies that emotion as such essentially involves valence (as in the valence thesis above). According to Kendall Walton and Alex Neill, when responding emotionally to an undesirable situation, we may confuse the undesirability of the situation with the perceived nature of the emotion, thereby thinking that it is the emotion that is unpleasant. “What is clearly disagreeable”, Walton says, “what we regret, are the things we are sorrowful about –the loss of an opportunity, the death of a friend─not the feeling or experience of sorrow itself.” (Walton, 1990, 257) Neill goes a step further, making the claim that what we actually mean when we say that an emotion is painful or unpleasant, is that an emotion in these terms is in fact attributing the relevant properties (painfulness, unpleasantness, and so on) to the situations themselves (Neill, 1992, 62).
The major problem for such a view, of course, is that it seems to radically run counter to common sense in holding that emotions do not in themselves feel good or bad. There certainly appears to be a fairly robust conceptual connection between certain emotion types and felt qualities that can be described as pleasure and pain. Perhaps, however, one could maintain that, although such a conceptual connection exists, it is not so strong as to rule out exceptions. For such a possibility, see Gaut, 1993.
The second class of solutions that appeal to pleasure, in solving the paradox of tragedy, take the pain involved in our engagement with fiction to be genuine, sometimes even significant, but take this pain to be compensated by some pleasure experienced in response to either the work or some other source.
One general solution to the paradox of tragedy is to say that, although works of fiction can surely elicit unpleasant states in audiences, they can also elicit pleasant ones. An explanation for why we are motivated to engage with such works is that they usually elicit states that are on the whole more pleasant than unpleasant.
A version of this solution is the one defended by Noel Carroll in his book on horror (Carroll, 1990). Carroll argues that monsters, such as vampires and werewolves, often violate our categorial schemes. In doing so, they unsurprisingly can look threatening, scary, and disgusting, explaining in turn why we can experience emotions such as fear and disgust towards them. However, in challenging our categorial schemes, monsters can also trigger our curiosity. Monsters are indeed things that fascinate us. According to Carroll, the pleasure that is derived from our getting to know more about them can compensate for the unpleasant states we may initially experience, particularly when the narration is such as to arouse our curiosity. The pain is for Carroll “the price to be paid for the pleasure of [the monsters’] disclosure” (1990, 184).
One problem with Carroll’s view is that not all horror stories involve monsters, that is, things that challenge our categorial schemes in the way that werewolves do. Psychopaths and serial killers, for instance, do not seem to be monsters in this sense; they are, as Berys Gaut says, “instances of an all-too-real phenomenon” (Gaut, 1993, 334). Carroll, however, could give up his appeal to monsters in particular, and claim rather that the relevant characters in the horror genre have the ability to elicit our curiosity and the resulting intellectual pleasures.
A more serious problem is that Carroll’s explanation does not seem to be adequate when we go beyond the particular case of horror. The fact that we enjoy watching drama films does not seem to be explainable solely in terms of our curiosity and fascination for odd characters. One possible response to this worry is that intellectual pleasures need not be derived from the satisfaction of our curiosity, and that such pleasures can rather be derived from a variety of sources, including things that do not elicit our curiosity. One problem with this solution would be why the relevant pleasures should be exclusively intellectual, rather than (say) both intellectual and affective. (See Affective Mixture.) In addition, the proponent of this solution may need to motivate the thought that it is in virtue of the pleasures they produce that the relevant intellectual states (such as learning about the characters) are valuable to us, as opposed to the fact that such states are intrinsically valuable. Why should it be the pleasure that one has as a result of learning about the personality of a work’s characters that is the primary motivating factor in our engaging with fiction? Why can it not be the fact that one, say, is able to get a new perspective on what it is to be human, regardless of whether the painful experiences that one may undergo are compensated by pleasant ones? (See Non-Pleasure-Centered Solutions.)
Susan Feagin (1983), another proponent of the compensatory solution, argues that we are motivated to engage with works of fiction that elicit negative emotions, not because the works themselves elicit pleasant experiences in greater proportion, but because of certain responses that we have towards the negative emotions themselves. In a nutshell, for Feagin, an awareness of the fact that we are the kind of people to experience, for instance, pity for Anna Karenina, results in a pleasurable state that compensates for the painful emotions that we have. It feels good, on this view, to realize that we care about the right things.
This solution suffers from a number of problems. First, it does not appear to be applicable to all the relevant cases, such as horror fictions. Many works of horror fiction certainly do not involve ‘sympathetic’ emotions such as pity, and involve rather fear and disgust. Furthermore, it doesn’t seem right to say that, when we experience fear and disgust in response to horror, we enjoy the fact that we are the kind of people to feel fear and disgust.
A second problem with Feagin’s view concerns its appeal to the notion of a meta-response. One thing to notice is that it does not sit well with the phenomenology of our engagement with many fictions. When watching a movie involving a serial killer, our attention is mostly focused on the events depicted, and rarely on ourselves; when we feel sad for an innocent character that has been killed, we do not seem to be sad for her and enjoy being the kind of person who can be sad for innocent people who have been murdered. Such a thought, it seems, rarely occurs to us. Of course, such self-congratulatory thoughts may occur, and may sometimes contribute to one’s overall enjoyment of the work, but they don’t seem necessary for it to be the case that one enjoys fictional works that elicit unpleasant experiences.
On one popular understanding of Aristotle’s famous theory of catharsis (see Lucas, 1928), the major motivation behind our desire to watch tragedy is that, by experiencing negative emotions, we are in turn able to expel them (by letting them go away), which somehow provides us with a pleasurable state. It is not, on such a view, the negative emotions that are pleasurable, but the fact that, after having been experienced, they are purged.
One issue this solution fails to address is that the pleasure that one derives from the experience of an unpleasant state terminated (as when one stops having a toothache after taking medicine) compensates for the unpleasantness of the state one was initially in. Moreover, the proponent of the catharsis solution must tell us why the relief that one gets from the extinction of the painful experiences is what typically motivates us in pursuing an engagement with the relevant fictional works. The fact that one will suffer for some time but then be ‘healed’ in a way that is very pleasant hardly sounds like a reason for one to accept to undergo the suffering in the first place. (For further reading, see Smuts, 2009, 50-51.)
Perhaps Aristotle meant to capture a different phenomenon by appealing to the notion of purgation, however. For instance, he could have taken purgation to involve emotions that people unconsciously had before engaging with the work, and that the work would help express themselves, leading to a pleasurable ‘release’ of some inner tension. Despite its possible intuitive appeal, such a solution remains to be developed in a clear and convincing way. (See Aristotle: Poetics for further details.)
The final pleasure-centered compensatory view that is worth mentioning holds that it does not really matter what kind of experience is supposed to compensate for the pain involved in the negative emotions; what is important is that there be some such experience. For instance, the negative emotions that we feel in response to a drama may be compensated by the joy we experience in realizing that it has a happy ending. Relief may often play a role as well, as when we are relieved that the main character is not going to die after all, something we were afraid would happen throughout the movie or novel.
The view, moreover, does not deny that something like the purgation of certain negative emotions may sometimes elicit pleasurable states. As Patricia Greenspan, a defender of this view, says, “it is not the release of fear that is pleasurable, at least in immediate terms, but that fact that one is soon released from it.” (1988, 32) However, the view denies that this is the only way painful states can be compensated. Such states can be compensated by any positive affective state that is called for by the work: joy, relief, a pleasant sense of immunity, the pleasure of having had a meaningful experience, admiration, and perhaps even self-congratulatory meta-responses. What matters, on this view, is the fact that some pleasant state or other is sufficiently strong to compensate for any unpleasant state the audience may otherwise have.
One advantage of the view is that it readily explains why people sometimes have to close the book they’re reading, or leave the movie theater: they have reached a point where the unpleasant emotions they experience have attained such a level of intensity that they don’t think the work could in any way compensate for them. In addition, the account has a straightforward explanation of why some of us do not like genres, such as horror, that tend to elicit negative emotions in audiences: the positive experiences they have, if any, do not typically compensate for the negative ones.
Another advantage of the present account is its ability to be applied to a wide range of cases, from horror and tragedy to drama and soap opera. Given that it allows a variety of mental states to play the compensatory role, it is less vulnerable to counter-examples.
The main problem with such a view, as with all pleasure-centered views, is simply that not all works of fiction that we are motivated to engage with succeed in compensating for the unpleasant states they elicit in the relevant way and may even leave us utterly depressed or disturbed. For example, Albert Camus’ The Stranger does not seem to elicit many pleasant experiences in readers, at any rate none that are likely to compensate for the pain elicited; many people who fully know what to expect may nevertheless be motivated to read it, suggesting that pleasure is not always what we are trying to get when pursuing an engagement with works of fiction. Pleasure may not be the only thing that negative emotions can buy.
According to recent proposals, we beg the question if we assume that the paradox of tragedy asks us to explain how we can take pleasure in response to artworks eliciting negative responses in audiences. Unless we are committed to a form of motivational hedonism according to which nothing other than pleasure can account for the pervasiveness of the motivation to engage with works of fiction eliciting negative emotions, the question arises as to whether some other factor(s) may play the relevant motivating role.
We may sometimes find ourselves in conflict between going to see a movie that, although depressing, may teach us some valuable lessons about life, and doing some less painful activity (such as watching comedy). If we end up choosing to see the depressing movie, it is clearly not because one is hoping that it will give one more pleasure than pain. The pain may indeed be the cost of gaining something of value, regardless of whether the having of that thing turns out to be pleasurable.
Below are examples of theories that do not take pleasure to be the main, or the only, factor that explains our willingness to engage with works of fiction eliciting negative emotions. Notice that they can be viewed as compensatory theories that do not primarily appeal to pleasure.
A clear example of the kind of view under discussion is one that Hume introduces and rejects in his essay on tragedy, and that he attributes to L’Abbé Dubos. According to Dubos, the thing that we most want when we pursue an engagement with tragedy is a ‘relief from boredom’. As life can sometimes be dull, he thinks, we may find it better to feel any emotion, even negative ones, as long as it delivers us from our boredom.
Dubos’ view is attractive for a number of reasons. First, it is very simple in that it explains the motivation we have to engage with tragedy by appealing to a single overarching desire: the desire to avoid boredom. Second, it makes it possible for people to pursue an engagement with works of fiction that they know will not elicit positive experiences that would compensate for the negative ones.
Of course, it is doubtful that a desire to avoid boredom is actually the underlying motivation behind all engagements with tragedy. Even if Dubos’ proposal does not work, it still provides a recipe for constructing a number of plausible views. If the desire to avoid boredom is not the relevant overarching desire, this does not mean that there is no such desire to be found. For instance, it could be the case that the relevant desire is the desire to have meaningful experiences, whatever their specific nature. According to a recent proposal (Smuts, 2007), when we engage in works of fiction such as tragedies and horror films, what we essentially desire is to get a ‘rich’ experience out of it. This experience, moreover, can be provided by a variety of mental states, including learning about certain characters, having our desire to avoid boredom fulfilled, having a sense of security (since, after all, the events depicted in fictional works are not real), feeling alive, and any other valuable mental state that can be had in the context of an encounter with the work. In addition, such mental states need not be particularly pleasant ones, as when one is being made aware of certain nasty truths about human nature.
One might wonder why there is a focus on experience here, in addition to what the notion of experience at play here is supposed to amount to. It is perfectly conceivable that some consumers of painful fiction are motivated to engage with it for non-experiential reasons. It is not the fact that they will have valuable experiences per se that may motivate them, but the fact that they will acquire certain valuable states whose phenomenology need not be experienced as intrinsically valuable. For instance, one can be reluctant to learn sad truths about the world via literature, but nonetheless pursue this activity because the relevant knowledge is valuable in its own right. Of course, the acquisition of the relevant knowledge may be experienced as meaningful or valuable, but it may not be what one ultimately pursues. One possible response from the rich response theorist is that, by and large, people (or, perhaps, people who are motivated by distinctively aesthetic or artistic considerations) are predominantly motivated to pursue an engagement with artworks eliciting unpleasant emotions because they will provide them with some valuable experience. This, however, would prevent the rich experience theorist from generalizing her account to all cases of painful activities that we are motivated in pursuing. (See next section.)
An alternative way to solve the paradox of tragedy is not by appealing to an overarching desire, though such a desire may ultimately exist, but to simply accept that there are many motivating reasons for which we pursue an engagement with the relevant fictions. Like the rich experience theory, such a pluralist solution does not deny that pleasure may sometimes be a motivating factor. What matters however is that we expect from an engagement with any particular work of fiction more benefits than costs, benefits that can be realized by a variety of things: knowledge (including ‘sad truths’), a sense of being alive, an avoidance of boredom, an appreciation of aesthetic properties—any value that can be gained from an interaction with the relevant work. Pluralism about the reasons motivating our engagement with tragedy, therefore, differs from the rich experience theory in that it remains non-committal regarding the existence of an overarching desire under which all these reasons may fall.
The pluralist solution, notably, not only explains why we are motivated to engage with works of fiction that elicit negative emotions in audiences, it also seems to have the resources to provide an explanation for why we are motivated to pursue any activity that tends to elicit negative emotions. Why are some motivated to practice bungee jumping, mountain climbing, fasting, and any other activity that one can think of and that involves displeasure to some non-negligible extent? Because, presumably, it has some positive value that compensates for the displeasure that one may experience, positive value that need not be realized by pleasure. In contrast to the rich experience theory, furthermore, the pluralist solution does not place any constraint on the kind of thing whose positive value may compensate for the displeasure we may experience in the relevant contexts; it indeed does not even have to be a mental state. This is partly what makes an extension of the pluralist solution possible. To take a mundane case, getting one’s wisdom teeth removed may be valuable, and therefore something we may be motivated to pursue, despite the unpleasant side-effects, not merely because one will have pleasurable or other valuable experiences in the future, but partly because doing so contributes positively to one’s health.
Whether the paradox of tragedy may ultimately be part of a broader phenomenon, and, if so, whether it should nonetheless be solved in a way that is special to it, are matters for further discussion.
As hinted at in our discussion of the paradox of fiction, it is one thing to establish that we are capable of experiencing genuine emotions in response to fictional characters and situations (and perhaps in response to expressive properties of musical works, depending on one’s view on the matter); it is quite another thing to establish that such responses are rational. Colin Radford, let’s recall, attempted to solve the paradox by declaring us irrational in experiencing the relevant emotions. After all, for him, since there is nothing to be afraid, sad, or angry about, having such emotions in the context of an encounter with fictional characters cannot be as rational as having them in the context of an encounter with real people. If our emotions in response to artworks fall short of being fully rational, the worry therefore goes, it becomes hard to see where their apparent value could really lie. Are our emotional responses to fiction in any way justifiable?
Let’s distinguish two broad kinds of justification that emotions can be thought to have. On the one hand, emotions can be epistemically justified in the sense that they give us an accurate representation of the world; the fact that emotions can be rational in this way (at least in principle) is a straightforward consequence of their being cognitive or representational states. On the other hand, emotions can be justified by non-epistemic reasons. For instance, a given instance of anger, with its characteristic expressions, can turn out to be useful in scaring potential threats away.
Presumably, when Radford declared us ‘irrational’ in experiencing emotions in response to entities that we believe do not exist, he meant that there is something epistemically wrong with them. By analogy, there is arguably something wrong from an epistemological standpoint with someone who is afraid of a harmless spider precisely because the spider does not constitute a real threat.
One way to deny that emotions in response to fiction (and representational artworks generally) are irrational in the relevant sense is by saying that the epistemic norms to which they ought to comply are in some way different from those at play in the case of belief. Whereas it would be wrong to believe that there is such a person as Sherlock Holmes after having read Conan Doyle’s novels, it may nonetheless be epistemically acceptable to experience admiration for him. The difference between the epistemic norms governing belief and those governing emotion may lie in the fact that those governing the latter put a lower threshold on what counts as adequate evidence than those governing the former. (See Greenspan, 1988, and Gilmore, 2011, for discussion.)
It seems plausible that some emotions at least are epistemically appropriate responses to the content of fictional stories. In many cases, emotions seem required for a proper appreciation and understanding of the work. Reading War and Peace without experiencing any emotion whatsoever hardly makes possible the kind of understanding that is expected of the reader. Furthermore, it appears quite intuitive to say that, without emotion, an appreciation of the aesthetic qualities of certain artworks, such as those possessed by their narrative structure, would be at best highly impoverished. Radford could reply however that such emotions are uncontroversial, as they are directed at properties of the work rather than at its fictional content. The problem with this response is that even such emotions may need to rely on prior emotions that have been directed at the content of the work.
Even if the emotions we experience in response to fictional artworks are epistemically irrational, they still may be rational in respects that are not epistemic. The point of departure of such a claim is that there is a sense in which the relevant emotions are not completely irrational; they sometimes make perfect sense. As a result, perhaps their value lies in their enabling us to achieve either non-epistemic goods or knowledge about the actual world (as opposed to some putative fictional world). An example of a non-epistemic good may be what can be roughly called spiritual growth. It is commonly thought that literature can somehow educate its audience, not by giving it information about the world, but by playing with its emotions in a way that is beneficial. It seems certainly right that fictions, by presenting us novel situations, can condition our emotions by making us feel what we would not have in real-life situations. Moreover, fiction may enable its audiences to experience empathetic emotions towards types of characters (and their situations) of which they may have no significant knowledge prior to the engagement with the work, contributing potentially to certain openness to the unknown. (It is worth noting that this may provide an additional reason to favor the non-pleasure-centered solutions to the paradox of tragedy introduced above.) Additionally, given the capacity of fictions to modify our emotional repertoire, thereby potentially modifying our values, some philosophers have emphasized the genuine possibility of acquiring moral knowledge by means of an engagement with fiction. See Nussbaum, 1992, for a discussion on the ways literature can contribute to moral development.
It is worth pointing out dangers that are commonly thought to be at play in the fact that we regularly engage emotionally with fictional entities. Certain works of fiction, for instance, such as some works of drama, are designed to arouse very intense emotional responses in audiences. Some of us may feel that there is something wrong, indeed highly sentimental, with indulging in such activities. Perhaps this is because of a norm of proportionality that is at play in our judgment; perhaps this is because of another norm. In any case, sentimentality is often taken to be a bad thing. See Tanner, 1976, for a classic discussion.
In addition to sentimentality, one may worry that works of fiction have the ability to arouse in audiences ‘sympathetic’ feelings for morally problematic characters (see Feagin, 1983), and perhaps in the long run be detrimental to one’s moral character. Whether this is true, however, is an empirical question that cannot be answered from the armchair.
Whether or not the experience of emotions in response to artworks is on the whole rational remains a very live question, a question that, given the irresistible thought that artworks are valuable partly because of the emotional effect they have on us, is of prime importance. (See Matravers, 2006, for further discussion.)
There are at least three main problems that arise at the intersection of emotions and the arts. The first problem is that of explaining how it is possible to experience genuine emotions in response to fictional events and non-representational strings of sounds. The second problem is finding a rationale for our putative desire to engage with works of art that systematically trigger negative affective states in us (regardless of whether such states count as genuine emotions). Assuming the claim that works of art do sometimes trigger genuine emotions in us, the third problem is the problem whether the relevant responses can be said to be rational (given that, after all, they are systematically directed at non-existent or non-meaningful entities). We have seen that each of these problems admits more or less plausible answers that may require a revision of our pre-theoretical beliefs about emotion, on the one hand, and artworks, on the other. Whether a non-revisionary solution to each of these problems is possible, and whether its lack of non-revisionary implications would give this solution the upper hand over alternative solutions, are questions the reader is encouraged to consider.
It is worth emphasizing that the list of problems this article deals with is far from exhaustive. One promising avenue of research is the thorough study of the relationship between emotions and other mental capacities, including imagination. Of particular interest in this area is the phenomenon of imaginative resistance whereby an audience is reluctant to imaginatively engage with fictional works that require them to imagine situations that run contrary to its moral beliefs (such as a world where the torture of innocents is morally permissible). Given that imaginative resistance plausibly implies the presence of certain emotions, such as indignation and guilt, and the absence of others, such as joy and pride, we can legitimately ask what is the precise relationship between our reluctance to imagine certain states of affairs and the emotional responses that are often found to accompany this reluctance (see, for instance, Moran, 1994). If emotion turned out to play a role in the explanation of imaginative resistance in response to fiction, this would give us strong ground for taking the relationship between emotion, fiction, and morality very seriously.
University of Manchester
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