The relationship between art and epistemology has been forever tenuous and fraught with much debate. It seems fairly obvious that we gain something meaningful from experiences and interactions with works of art. It does not seem so obvious whether or not the experiences we have with art can produce propositional knowledge that is constituted by true justified belief. In what follows I will give some historical background on the debate and flesh out some of the important issues surrounding the question “(What) can we learn from art?”
While engaging objects aesthetically is both a perceptual and emotionally laden activity, it is also fundamentally cognitive. As such, aesthetic engagement is wedded to a number of epistemological concerns. For example, we commonly claim to know things about art, and we respect what critics say about various genres of art. We say that we thought the play was good or bad, that the emotions it produced were warranted, justified, manipulative, or appropriate. People commonly claim that they learn from art, that art changes their perception of the world, and that art has an impact on the way that they see and make sense of the world. It is also widely believed that works of art, especially good works of art, can engender beliefs about the world and can, in turn, provide knowledge about the world. But what is it exactly that we can know about art? What is it precisely that art can teach us? Is there any sort of propositional content that art can provide which resembles the content that we claim to need for other kinds of knowledge claims? These are the sorts of questions that frame the debate about whether, and in what sense, art is cognitive.
The question whether or not we can learn from art goes as far back as Plato, as he warned about the dangers of indulging in both mimetic and narrative representations of the world and of human actions. The ensuing debate has endured in the contemporary philosophical literature and has spurred the further question of how we can learn from art. The arguments both for and against the notion that we can learn from art have developed as well. The debate is not any less complicated than it was historically, nor is it any closer to being resolved.
There are two extreme positions that one could take in answer to the question, “Can we learn from art?” Either we can, and do, learn from art, or we cannot in any meaningful sense attain knowledge that is non-propositional. Those who argue that we can learn from art generally argue that our engagement with art arouses certain emotions or activities that are able to facilitate or produce knowledge. They would argue that there is some aspect of the artwork which can help to produce greater understanding of the world around us. Art is thus seen as a source of insight and awareness that cannot be put into propositional language; but it can help us to see the world in a new or different way.
Those who deny that we can learn from art often argue that there can be no knowledge that is not propositionally-based knowledge. Jerome Stolnitz, for example, claims in a 1992 article that art does not and cannot contribute to knowledge primarily because it does not generate any sort of truths. Those who argue this line want to defend the notion that since art cannot provide facts or generate arguments, then we cannot learn from it. Further, those who believe we cannot learn from art argue that art cannot be understood as a source of knowledge because it is not productive of knowledge, taken in the traditional sense of justified true belief. Art does not have propositional content that can be learned in a traditional way, even though it can been seen to have effects that promote knowledge and that can either encourage or undermine the development of understanding. Art can thus be rejected as a source of knowledge because it does not provide true beliefs, and because it does not and cannot justify the beliefs that it does convey. Both extremes agree that if art can be seen as a source of knowledge, the only way that it could possibly fulfill such a function would be if that knowledge reflected something essential to art’s nature and value.
Plato points out in the Republic (595-601) that it is possible to make a representation of something without having knowledge of the thing represented. Painters represent cobblers when the painters have no knowledge of shoemaking themselves, and poets write about beauty and courage without necessarily having any clear knowledge of these virtues. Only philosophers, the lovers of wisdom, and especially those who strive to intuit the Forms and employ abstract reasoning, can really have knowledge of these virtues. Artists mislead their viewers into thinking that knowledge lies in the represented (mimetic) object. Plato’s concern in the Republic extends to the literary arts in particular, which are created with the express purpose to move us emotionally in such a way that one’s character could be corrupted (605-608). The more one indulges in emotions aroused by representation, according to Plato, the more likely one is to suffer the effects of an unbalanced soul, and ultimately the development of a bad character.
Aristotle agreed with Plato that art could indeed influence the development of one’s moral character. While Plato thought that we can learn from art and that it is detrimental to one’s character, however, Aristotle argued that indulging in the same mimetic emotions that Plato warned us of can actually benefit one’s character by producing an emotional catharsis (Poetics 1449b24-29). By purging the tragic emotions in particular, Aristotle held, one has a better chance of being more rational in everyday life. Thus, while both philosophers believed that we learn from art, one (Plato) argued that the knowledge gained was detrimental while the other (Aristotle) argued that it was beneficial.
Continuing with the line of argument Aristotle began, all the way through the Renaissance and beyond, philosophers have defended the notion that we can learn from art, and that poetry and fiction engage the emotions in a helpful, rather than detrimental, way. The Romantics dealt with this question in a manner that the earlier rationalists and empiricists did not. The rationalists rejected the idea that the imagination could be considered a source of knowledge, with Descartes going so far as to dismiss what he called “the blundering constructions of the imagination.” Returning to the ideals of Plato, the rationalists strictly employed a knowledge requirement involving justified true belief. Empiricist epistemology too is particularly unhelpful when it comes to explaining how we might gain justified knowledge from fictional or representational situations. For it seems impossible to learn actual things from fictional situations.
The Romantics provided the real beginnings of an argument against the passive accounts of knowledge for which the empiricists argued. Romantic epistemology emphasizes the role of the imagination in addition to (or over) reason. This allowed for the notion that there is not merely one right way to know, and that there is not only one right way to view, experience, understand, and construct the world.
The Romantics adopted three main tenets concerning the relationship between literature (and art more generally) and truth. The first denied that there is any one point of view from which Truth can be determined. The second began to question the Augustinian conviction that art and literature, like science, should concern only general features of nature. The third tenet, which the Romantics developed more fully, concerned the notion of transcendence, especially in association with growth. Natural science is able to describe the physical world, but only from a single point of view (Harrison 1998). Art and literature can describe the world in a myriad of ways, transcending experience of the physical world into the emotional and even the supernatural. Although art does not record truths about the world in the same way that science does, it can give insight into the different ways that we understand the world and with different degrees of accuracy. It is those degrees of accuracy that continue to be called into question.
David Novitz (1998) points out that there are three basic kinds of knowledge claims we can make about the arts, all of which are distinguished by their objects. The first concerns what we claim to know or believe about the art object itself and whatever imaginary or fictional worlds might be connected to that object. For example, I can claim to know things about the way the light reflects in Monet’s Water Lilies. I can also claim to know things about Anna Karenina’s relationships with her husband and with her lover, Vronsky. Beyond this, we may feel justified in our pity for Anna, because of the way Tolstoy’s novel presents her story. Can my knowledge of Anna be meaningful, however, or be considered knowledge at all in the traditional sense (justified true belief) if Anna Karenina is a non-referring name? Further, how can one’s interpretation of her situation be any more legitimate than anyone else’s? Can single interpretations hold value over time and across cultures? Without the propositional content used to legitimize the standard analysis of knowledge, it seems that the knowledge claims we have about the content of an artwork will never have the same kind of validity. Whether or not that same kind of validity is required also needs to be called into question.
The second kind of knowledge claim we can make about art concerns what we know or believe to be an appropriate or warranted emotional response to the artwork. We often believe that works of art are only properly understood if we have a certain kind of emotional response to them. One problem here, of course, concerns how it is that we know what kind of response is appropriate to a particular work. On occasion we talk to friends about a response they had to a particular work of art that was manifestly different from the one we had. How is it possible to judge which response is more appropriate or justified? Even suggesting that one should respond as if a novel, for example, were to be taken as an account of true events, with responses following as if the events depicted therein were actually happening or had happened, does not solve the problem. For one thing, not all emotional responses to real events are taken as equally justified. For another, most novels are not meant to be taken as true (despite the “report model” of emotive response [see Matravers 1997]). The fact that we do respond emotively to art, and to fiction in particular, would seem to indicate that there is something in the artwork that is worth responding to, even if it is not the same thing possessed by the objects we respond to outside the art world.
The third kind of knowledge claim we can have about art concerns the sort of information art can provide about the world. That is, how is it that we can gain real knowledge from fictional or non-real events or activities? It is widely accepted that art does, in fact, convey important insight into the way we order and understand the world. It is also widely acknowledged that art gives a certain degree of meaning to our lives. Art, and literature in particular, can elicit new beliefs and even new knowledge about the world. But the concern is this: fiction is not produced in a way that is reflective of the world as it actually is. It might be quite dangerous, in fact, for one to obtain knowledge about human affairs only from fiction. For example, it could be downright unhealthy for me to get my sense of what it is like to be in love from romance novels alone.
We can easily be experientially misled by art. The so-called empathic beliefs, those we gain from experiencing art, should be based on and enhanced by our broader experience of the world and should not arise independently of our other beliefs. But here the problem of justification returns. That is, if the empathic beliefs we gain from our experience of art actually coincide with our experience of the real world, then they can pass as empathic knowledge (that is, beliefs become true and justified when they are connected to other justified beliefs). The problem is that often the emotions and beliefs that we adopt empathically turn out to be temporary, since they are not grounded in concrete experience. Can the experience we have with a work of art be confirming in and of itself, or must there be another, external authority to make the experience, or at least the knowledge gained from the experience, legitimate? It seems that much of what we learn about the world does come from art, and thus the justificatory claims to knowledge must be reconsidered.
The propositional theory of knowledge holds that one must have justified true belief in the content of a proposition in order to have knowledge. This appears reasonable under normal circumstances, but seems not to work at all in the case of art. It seems odd, in fact, to hold that in order to show that one has learned from a work of fiction, one must show that the work has propositional content of a general or philosophical nature, or that it provides experience that cannot be gained in any other way. If we can learn from art, we must be able to do so in a manner that diverges from the traditional notion of justified true belief, but that still holds some sort of legitimate ground.
What kind of justification is needed to ground these potential knowledge claims that art provides? First of all, we must be at least somewhat aware of what the new knowledge consists of. Moreover, one’s engagement with the artwork should provide at least some degree of justification (e.g., I feel pity for Anna Karenina because she is in an unfortunate set of circumstances that she feels she has no control over. I am justified in my emotional response to her if I can see that she is in a truly pitiable situation). It is important to distinguish learning from art from merely being affected or influenced by it, or even from being challenged by it. Accounts of knowledge provided by art should be able to identify clearly what it is about the artwork itself, qua artwork, which prompts knowledge. A cognitivist account in particular will require first that the content of the work be specifiable (what is it we learn?); second, that the demands for justification be respected; and third, that these accounts appeal directly to aesthetic experience (Freeland 1997).
It would seem that there is indeed something about the content of an artwork that can be said to be knowledge-producing. But how can that be so? The artist himself or herself is not the ultimate authority here, since his/her knowledge or expertise is not necessarily directly transferred into the artwork. Furthermore, even if it were capable of being transferred clearly, it is not always the case that observers will interpret the meaning or significance of a work of art in any standard way. What the artist knows and how others experience his/her art are not directly related enough to justify epistemic legitimacy. It also seems unjustified to assume that there are intrinsic features of an artwork that are always clearly identifiable. So the knowledge we gain from art has more to do with the relationship between the art object and the consumer than anything else.
Another way we might argue for the possibility of gaining knowledge from art is by rejecting the justified true belief account of knowledge. There might be more than one way to know, in other words, and more than one way to learn. One of the most common alternative suggestions concerning the knowledge that art elicits is that it is moral knowledge that we gain. These arguments are based primarily of the presumption that art, and literature especially, can provide experiential and emotional stimulation, and that moral knowledge is not simply propositional in nature. It has been objected, however, that such stimulation is not equal to the propositional content that more traditional forms of knowledge can provide.
Eileen John (2001) identifies two arguments for the claim that moral knowledge can be gained from art. The first argument stresses the capacity of art to give us examples of, and exercise in, certain morally pertinent activities. Thus, we come across circumstances and situations in art and literature that we might not otherwise come across in our daily lives. If we simulate our own reactions to the situations the work presents us with, we have an idea of how we might respond or how we would feel (see especially Kendall Walton’s theory of Make-Believe and Simulation Theory). On this view, works of art can provide us with simulated or “off-line” emotional responses that could not be achieved otherwise.
The second argument is based on the assumption that we can acquire specific substantive moral knowledge from art. That is, works of art are taken to possess the ability to give us imaginative and epistemic access to certain kinds of experiences relevant to moral knowledge and judgment. Not only can we respond emotionally to particular moral situations presented through artworks; we cannot help but find ourselves morally outraged or saddened by the plights of certain fictional characters.
Noël Carroll (2002) lays out three additional objections to the suggestion that art can provide knowledge. The first objection he calls the “banality argument”: the idea that “the significant truths that many claim art and literature may afford—that is, general truths about life, usually of an implied nature (as opposed to what is ‘true in the fiction’)—are in the main, trivial.” Compared to the knowledge we are able to obtain from propositional statements and arguments, the kind of things works of literature are can point out are so obvious as to be useless. Carroll continues by stating that “art and knowledge are not sources of moral knowledge, but, at best, occasions for activating antecedently possessed knowledge.” The best it seems that art and literature can do is to point out things we already know and believe.
The second objection Carroll outlines against the notion that we can learn from art is what he calls the “no-evidence argument.” This focuses on the fact that not only is anything we gain from art and literature banal, but for any knowledge to be legitimate, it needs to be warranted and must be supported by evidence. Few artworks, however, supply any evidence at all in defense of a particular view. One of the reasons interpretations seem to legitimately vary so widely is precisely due to this lack of solid evidence. Moreover, fiction is not a reliable source of evidence when it comes to literature and other arts.
Carroll calls the third objection the “no-argument argument.” As he explains, “it maintains that even if artworks contained or implied general truths, neither the artworks themselves nor the critical discourse that surrounds them engages in argument, analysis, and debate in defense of the alleged truths.” If artworks do indeed suggest any sort of knowledge, Carroll points out, it can only be suggested or implied but never argued for or defended. Furthermore, the critical discourse that surrounds artworks is not generally focused on arguing for or against any of the claims made in the artwork itself.
The fact that we do respond to works of art, and that we commonly believe we can and do learn from such works, is not enough to justify that learning actually occurs. However, it is enough to make us examine our presuppositions about what constitutes knowledge, and perhaps may lead us to reconceive knowledge in such a way that we may eventually come to understand how it can be gained non-propositionally.
Sarah E. Worth
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 25, 2005 | Originally published: