Traditionally, there were two opposing philosophical positions taken with respect to the legitimacy of the ethical evaluation of art: ‘moralism’ and ‘autonomism’, where moralism is the view that the aesthetic value of art should be determined by, or reduced to, its moral value, while autonomism holds that it is inappropriate to apply moral categories to art; they should be evaluated by ‘aesthetic’ standards alone. Recent work on the ethical criticism of art has proposed several new positions; more moderate versions of autonomism and moralism which lie between the two extremes described above. The issue has now become not one of whether moral evaluations of art works are appropriate, but rather, whether they should be described as aesthetic evaluations. The contemporary debate focuses on narrative art, which is seen as having unique features to which ethical criticism is particularly pertinent. Attempts have been made to simplify the issue of the ethical criticism of art by distancing peripheral issues such as causal claims about the effects of art on its audience and censorship. However, there is still considerable interest in the possibility of certain narrative artworks having the potential to play an important role in moral education. The debate over the ethical criticism of art therefore highlights some of the central reasons why we value narrative art, as well as questioning the scope, or the parameters, of our concept of the aesthetic.
‘Ethical criticism’ refers to the inclusion of an ethical component in the interpretation and evaluation of art. The two traditional opposing positions taken with respect to ethical criticism are ‘autonomism’ and ‘moralism’. The former claims that ethical criticism is never legitimate since moral and aesthetic value are autonomous, while the latter reduces aesthetic value to moral value. The extreme versions of autonomism and moralism, their appeal and their flaws, are discussed in section two.
In recent years, debate over ethical criticism has resurfaced, partly through the Ethical Criticism Symposium featured in Philosophy and Literature in 1997-8, which is discussed in the final section of this article, since it bears on the consideration of the causal thesis that certain literature can have positive moral effects on its audience. A second arm of the ethical criticism debate saw several more moderate, and more plausible, positions proposed. These are ‘moderate autonomism’, ‘moderate moralism’ and ‘ethicism’. In this body of literature too, the focus was on narrative art. What is at issue in the current debate is whether the realm of aesthetic value should be taken to include the moral value of narrative art (a) never, (b) only sometimes when an artwork displays moral features (merits or defects), or (c) whenever an artwork displays moral features (merits or defects). Due to differences between the modes of expression and content matter of the different art forms, it seems likely that what is true of the ethical criticism of narrative art, which often deals explicitly with human affairs and morality, may not be true of abstract art forms such as music and some fine arts and dance. Such art forms would require separate consideration and this is something which has not thus far been undertaken in the philosophical literature.
Section 3 considers the debate between moderate autonomism, defended by Anderson and Dean, and Noel Carroll’s moderate moralism, examining Carroll’s reasons for arguing that at least sometimes the moral features of narrative artworks are also aesthetic features. Section 4 introduces Berys Gaut’s ‘ethicism’, and examines the contention, made primarily by Anderson and Dean, that moderate moralism and ethicism are one and the same position. This claim is shown to be false, and the two positions are clearly distinguished. Much of the recent debate over ethical criticism – that is the debate between moderate autonomism, moderate moralism and ethicism – focusses on the flaws in the specific arguments presented for moderate moralism and ethicism. In fact, the central issue in the debate over ethical criticism, which is somewhat masked by the details, is how broadly the aesthetic should be defined. While the extreme positions, radical autonomism and radical moralism define the aesthetic most narrowly, the position which defines the aesthetic most broadly and inclusively is ethicism.
There are two extreme positions traditionally taken with respect to the relationship between art and morality; one is autonomism, or aestheticism, which is the view that it is inappropriate to apply moral categories to artworks, and that only aesthetic categories are relevant, while at the other end of the scale is moralism, the view that aesthetic objects should be judged wholly or centrally with respect to moral standards or values. Both autonomism and moralism are widely recognised to be problematic, as they are based on inadequate conceptions of art and aesthetic value.
Radical Moralism is the view that the aesthetic value of an artwork is determined by its moral value. The most extreme version of this position reduces all aesthetic value to moral value. Proponents of radical moralism include Tolstoy, who, arguing against definitions of art that equated art with beauty, said: “The inaccuracy of all these definitions arises from the fact that in them all … the object considered is the pleasure art may give, and not the purpose it may serve in the life of man and of humanity.” Tolstoy emphasised the moral significance of art in society as essential to the (aesthetic) value of art. Social reductionism, such as the ‘popular aesthetic’ endorsed by Pierre Bourdieu, Roger Taylor and others, is also a version of radical moralism. Radical moralism has been widely criticised for ignoring certain fundamental aspects of aesthetic value, such as formal features. The radical moralist will have some difficulty explaining how art can be distinguished from other cultural products, including such things as political speeches, due to their failure to include in their criteria for making judgments about aesthetic value anything that is a unique feature of art.
Autonomism and aestheticism are essentially the same position. The label ‘autonomism’ captures the fact that this position holds that aesthetic value is autonomous from other kinds of value, such as moral value. The label ‘aestheticism’ captures the fact that the position emphasises the importance of focussing on theaesthetic, that is, the pure aesthetic, features of artworks. Pure aesthetic qualities may include formal features and beauty or, for some autonomists, formal features only. It is important to note that formalism and autonomism are not identical positions, although advocates of formalism will tend to be autonomists. Formalism, rejected earlier, is the view that the proper way to respond to art is to respond to its formal features or, in other words, that the aesthetic value of an artwork is determined solely by its formal features. A formalist, such as Clive Bell, would not include beauty as something we should respond to in art, but those formalists who do include beauty regard it as something that is determined by the formal features the artwork possesses.
“Aestheticism’ is perhaps the more appropriate label for the extreme position subscribed to by the aesthete – that aesthetic value is the highest of all values. Interestingly, although the aesthete might not be interested in defending their position, any attempt to do so would likely involve appeals to moral standards; that is, they would have to give a justification for their view that one should take on a predominantly aesthetic attitude in life in terms of moral value. For example, Richard Posner, in ‘Against Ethical Criticism’, appears to identify himself as an aesthete, but, ironically, an aesthete who wants to provide a moral justification for his position: “The aesthetic outlook is a moral outlook, one that stresses the values of openness, detachment, hedonism, curiosity, tolerance, the cultivation of the self, and the preservation of a private sphere – in short, the values of liberal individualism.”(1997, p. 2) Aestheticism, in it’s most extreme form, could almost be seen as a version of radical moralism. In any case, both positions are equally reductive with respect to the scope of aesthetic value.
However, ‘aestheticism’ does not always refer to the extreme position, and the terms ‘autonomism’ and ‘aestheticism’ can be used interchangeably. Autonomism has become the predominant term used in recent literature, most likely because it does capture the notion that aesthetic value is held to be an autonomous realm of value by those who subscribe to any version of this position. Radical Autonomism is the view that the proper way to respond to art is to respond only to the pure aesthetic qualities, or what is ‘in the work itself’; while to bring moral values, or other social values, to bear on art is a mistake. The radical autonomist’s motto is ‘art for art’s sake’. Oscar Wilde is an example of a radical autonomist. He wrote in the Preface to The Picture of Dorien Gray: “…to art’s subject matter we should be more or less indifferent,” and “Life is the solvent that breaks up art, the enemy that lays waste her house.” Wilde’s statements on the topic of and and morality are those of an autonomist, although the subject matter of his own work dealt explicitly with moral issues. His position appears to have been not that literary art can’t deal with moral issues as part of its subject matter, but simply that they are irrelevant to the aesthetic value of the art, and should not influence the audience’s, or critic’s, aesthetic response to the work. An autonomist position such as this is based on a narrow understanding of the aesthetic value of art, which values the way in which the subject matter of such art is represented (which may include formal features and beauty), but not the subject matter itself (which may include moral features). However, autonomism, while purporting to give aesthetic value primacy, neglects many of the potential ways in which art can have aesthetic value. Such a view ignores the fact that certain art forms are culturally embedded, and, as such, are inextricably bound up with important social values, such as moral value.
Noel Carroll explains the appeal of radical autonomism with reference to the “common denominator argument”; that is, the argument that it is only those features common to all art that are the essential defining features of art, and it is only these features that should properly be regarded as being within the realm of the aesthetic. (See ‘Moderate Moralism’, BJA, 36:3, 1996) As Carroll points out, the fact that radical autonomists have a ready answer to the questions -What are the unique and essential features common to all art? – or – What are the defining features of art? – is a central reason for the appeal of their position. This feature of autonomism appears to provide a straightforward way of distinguishing art from non-art, as well as providing specific grounds upon which to defend the objectivity of aesthetic value. A further reason autonomism initially seems intuitive is that it is difficult to see how moral considerations could be pertinent across whole art forms, such as music, and abstract art of various kinds.(p. 226) The above reasons make radical autonomism an attractive position, but its narrow construal of the aesthetic is too narrow to adequately account for the aesthetic value of certain art forms, or particular artworks. Besides, as was discussed earlier, attempting to define art in terms of essential criteria common to all artworks is not a promising strategy; the nature of art defies such restrictions. Carroll argues that “we can challenge [the radical autonomist's] appeal to the nature of art with appeals to the natures of specific art forms or genres which, given what they are, warrant at least additional criteria of evaluation to supplement whatever the autonomist claims is the common denominator of aesthetic evaluation.” (p. 227)
What Carroll specifically has in mind is the role our moral understanding plays in our appreciation of narrative art. Carroll claims that narrative artworks are always incomplete, and that a certain amount of information has to be filled in by the reader or audience in order to make the work intelligible. This includes information which must be supplied by our moral understanding. He says: “…it is vastly improbable that there could be any substantial narrative of human affairs, especially a narrative artwork, that did not rely upon activating the moral powers of readers, viewers and listeners. Even modernist novels that appear to eschew ‘morality’ typically do so in order to challenge bourgeois morality and to enlist the reader in sharing their ethical disdain for it.” (p. 228) Examples of works which require the input of our moral understanding in order to make the narrative intelligible include Jane Austin’s Emma, George Elliot’s Middlemarch, and (ironically) Oscar Wilde’s The Picture of Dorian Gray.
Moderate autonomism, defended by J. Anderson and J. Dean, is a more plausible position than radical autonomism; it recognises that moral merits or defects can feature in the content of certain art forms and that sometimes moral judgments of artworks are pertinent. However, moderate autonomism is still an autonomist position in the sense that it maintains that the aesthetic value and the moral value of artworks are autonomous. According to moderate autonomism: “an artwork will never be aesthetically better in virtue of its moral strengths, and will never be worse because of its moral defects. / On a strict reading of moderate autonomism, one of its decisive claims is that defective moral understanding never counts against the aesthetic merit of a work. An artwork may invite an audience to entertain a defective moral perspective and this will not detract from its aesthetic value.”(Carroll, 1996, p. 232) It is this central claim that both Carroll and Gaut argue against.
Moderate autonomism stands in opposition to ‘Moderate moralism’: “[Moderate moralism] contends that some works of art may be evaluated morally (contra radical autonomism) and that sometimes the moral defects and/or merits of a work may figure in the aesthetic evaluation of the work.” (p. 236) The crucial difference between moderate autonomism and moderate moralism, then, is that while both agree that moral judgments can be legitimately made about certain artworks, moderate moralists contend that sometimes such judgments are aesthetic evaluations, while moderate autonomists hold that moral judgments about works of art are always outside the realm of the aesthetic. On the one hand, Anderson and Dean say, “some of the knowledge that art brings home to us may be moral knowledge. All this is granted when we agree that art is properly subject to moral evaluation. But why is this value aesthetic value?” (Anderson & Dean p. 160) On the other hand, Carroll says, “Moderate autonomists overlook the degree to which moral presuppositions play a structural role in the design of many artworks.”(Carroll 1996 p. 233) Carroll does not suggest that this is the only way in which moral features may contribute to a work’s aesthetic value; a more general account of this is described in the following section.
What is really at issue in the debate over ethical criticism is how broadly we define the aesthetic. But this is not simply arbitrary – what in fact are the boundaries of the aesthetic? Carroll aims to show, with reference to specific examples, that there are actual cases where a narrow construal of the aesthetic, such as the one adopted by moderate autonomists, is an inadequate way of understanding that work’s aesthetic value, and an inadequate way of understanding how we appreciate such artworks qua artworks. Even if moderate moralism is not the best way to explain the moral value of narrative artworks, Carroll is wise to turn to critical analysis of actual examples to support his argument, for this is where we can most clearly see the problems with moderate autonomism.
The central argument for moderate moralism (hereafter MM) is described as the ‘Common Reason Argument.’ Having first argued that many narrative artworks are incomplete in ways that require us to use our moral understanding in order to comprehend the work, Carroll then argues, with reference to examples, that because of this fact about narrative artworks, it is sometimes the case that a moral defect in a work will also be an aesthetic defect since it prevents us from fully engaging with that work. In other words, Carroll argues that in some cases the reason a work is morally flawed is the same reason the work is aesthetically flawed, and so in these cases the judgment that the work is morally flawed is also an aesthetic evaluation of that work. (Anderson & Dean, 1998, pp. 156-7) Mary Devereaux’s analysis ofTriumph of the Will provides an excellent example of this. (See her article ‘Beauty and Evil’ in Levinson,Aesthetics & Ethics, 1998). According to Devereaux, Triumph of the Will is morally problematic because it presents the Nazi regime as appealing. Although a morally sensitive audience might be able to appreciate some of the formal features exhibited in the film, such as the innovative camera work, such an audience would be unable to fully engage with the film due to an inability to accept the film’s central vision, that is, the glorification of Hitler and the Nazi regime. If the audience is unable to fully engage with the film’s central vision, this, according to Carroll’s MM, will count as an aesthetic defect in the film (because the magnitude of our aesthetic experience will be limited by our inability to fully engage with the film’s central theme). So, the very feature that makes the film morally defective is also one of most significant aesthetic defects in the film. Hence, the moral defectiveness and the aesthetic defectiveness are due to a common reason in this particular case.
In their argument against MM, Anderson and Dean construct two arguments, a ‘moral defect argument’ and an ‘aesthetic defect argument’, which, together, they take to represent the ‘common reason argument.’ The two arguments are presented as follows:
The Moral Defect Argument
- The perspective of the work in question is immoral.
- Therefore, the work ‘invites us to share [this morally] defective perspective’ (In one case we are invited to find an evil person sympathetic; in the other case, we are invited to find gruesome acts humorous.)
- Any work which invites us to share a morally defective perspective is, itself, morally defective.
- Therefore, the work in question is morally defective
The Aesthetic Defect Argument
- The perspective of the work in question is immoral.
- The immorality portrayed subverts the possibility of uptake. (In the case of the tragedy, the response of pity is precluded; in the case of the satire the savouring of parody is precluded.)
- Any work which subverts its own genre is aesthetically defective.
- Therefore, the work in question is aesthetically defective. (pp. 156-7)
Anderson and Dean focus their objection to MM on the fact that the one premise the moral defect argument and the aesthetic defect argument share (1) is not sufficient to establish either moral defectiveness or aesthetic defectiveness.(p. 157) This may be so, but Carroll responds to this by pointing out the common reason doesn’t need to be a sufficient reason. There may be other reasons that contribute to both the aesthetic evaluation and the moral evaluation of artworks, but in some cases these two groups of reasons overlap; where a reason is common to both groups, and is a central, if not sufficient, reason for both the conclusion that a work is morally defective, and the conclusion that the work is aesthetically defective. As Carroll puts it in his response to Anderson and Dean:
But why suppose that the relevant sense of reason here is sufficient reason? Admittedly a number of factors will contribute to the moral defectiveness and the aesthetic defectiveness of the work in question. The moderate moralist need only contend that among the complex of factors that account for the moral defectiveness of the artwork in question, on the one hand, and the complex of factors that explain the aesthetic defectiveness of the artwork, on the other hand, the evil perspective of the artwork will play a central, though perhaps not sufficient, explanatory role in both. (Carroll, 1998a, p423)
Carroll’s response to Anderson and Dean’s objection is convincing. There seems no reason to object to MM simply because the common reason shared the aesthetic defect argument and the moral defect argument is not a sufficient reason in either case.
Anderson and Dean eschew specific examples in their defense of MA, saying: ‘because of the complexity of particular cases, we have taken pains not to rest our case on the examination of them.” (A&D, 1998, p. 164). Since MM holds that moral judgments about artworks can be aesthetic evaluations in some cases, it is only necessary to show that the reason a work is morally defective is the same as the reason that work is aesthetically defective in a few actual cases in order to support MM. Carroll does give us some convincing examples, and Anderson and Dean do not show why Carroll is wrong in these particular cases. Given that there are at least some cases, such as Devereaux’s analysis of Triumph of the Will, in which it has been convincingly shown that the reason a work is morally meritorious or defective is the same reason that work is aesthetically meritorious or defective, it follows that moderate autonomism is false.
As previously mentioned, ‘moderate moralism’ holds that: “some works of art may be evaluated morally (contra radical autonomism) and that sometimes themoral defects and/or merits of a work may figure in the aesthetic evaluation of the work.” (Carroll, 1996, p. 236, my italics) ‘Ethicism’ holds that: “the ethical assessment of attitudes manifested by works of art is a legitimate aspect of the aesthetic evaluation of those works, such that, if a work manifests ethically reprehensible attitudes, it is to that extent aesthetically defective, and if a work manifest ethically commendable attitudes, it is to that extent aesthetically meritorious.” (See Berys Gaut’s ‘The Ethical Criticism of Art’ in Levinson, 1998, p. 182)
Anderson and Dean claim that MM and ethicism are ‘similar, if not identical’ (A&D, 1998, p. 157). They must mean that the positions are similar or identical in terms of scope, since Carroll and Gaut’s arguments clearly differ in detail. However, they are incorrect about this. The inclusion of ‘sometimes’ in Carroll’s statement of his position indicates that MM is a weaker position than ethicism – since there is no such qualification in Gaut’s statement of ethicism. As Carroll himself says, in his reply to Anderson and Dean: “…my case is more limited in scope than Gaut’s. Gaut seems willing to consider virtually every moral defect in a work of art an aesthetic defect, whereas I defend a far weaker claim – namely that sometimes a moral defect in an artwork can count as an aesthetic defect…” (Carroll, 1998a p. 419)
If we look at Gaut’s arguments for ethicism, it is clear how ethicism differs from MM in scope, as well as simply in detail. The argument for ethicism runs as follows (this is taken directly from “The Ethical Criticism of Art,” but I have numbered each step in the argument):
- A work’s manifestation of an attitude is a matter of the work’s prescribing certain responses toward the events described.
- If those responses are unmerited, because unethical, we have reason not to respond in the way prescribed.
- Our having reason not to respond in the way prescribed is a failure of the work.
- What responses the work prescribes is of aesthetic relevance.
- So the fact that we have reason not to respond in the way prescribed is an aesthetic failure of the work, that is to say, is an aesthetic defect.
- So a work’s manifestation of ethically bad attitudes is an aesthetic defect in it.
- Mutatis mutandis, a parallel argument shows that a work’s manifestation of ethically commendable attitudes is an aesthetic merit in it, since we have reason to adopt a prescribed response that is ethically commendable.
- So Ethicism is true. (Gaut, in Levinson, 2000, pp. 195-6)
Notice that this argument, in particular step (2), commit Gaut to the thesis that whenever a narrative artwork displays moral features, either merits or defects, these will always impact on the aesthetic value of that work to some degree. Certain flaws in Gaut’s argument have been identified by Anderson and Dean and by Carroll. The most significant of these will be examined a little later.
Early in his article, Gaut explicitly outlines the scope of ethicism. It is important to note that “ethicism does not entail the casual thesis that good art ethically improves people,” nor the reverse claim; that bad art corrupts.(p. 184) Gaut describes “the ethicist principle [as] a pro tanto one: it holds that a work is aesthetically meritorious (or defective) insofar as it manifests ethically admirable (or reprehensible) attitudes. (The claim could also be put like this: manifesting ethically admirable attitudes counts towardthe aesthetic merit of a work, and manifesting ethically reprehensible attitudes counts against its aesthetic merit.) (p. 182) There is an additional qualification, that, “the ethicist does not hold that manifesting ethically commendable attitudes is a necessary condition for a work to be aesthetically good: there can be good, even great, works of art that are ethically flawed. . . .Nor does the ethicist thesis hold that manifesting ethically good attitudes is a sufficient condition for a work to be aesthetically good.” (pp. 182-3) Gaut explains that “the ethicist can deny these necessity and sufficiency claims, because she holds that there are a plurality of aesthetic values, of which the ethical values of artworks are but a single kind,” and he suggests “we … need to make an all-things-considered judgment, balancing these aesthetic merits and demerits against one another to determine whether the work is, all things considered, good.”(p. 183) It is these features of ethicism – its recognition of a plurality of aesthetic qualities of which moral features are one kind and its commitment to an all-things-considered judgment of aesthetic value – which make ethicism a better way of understanding how the moral features of artworks impact on their aesthetic value than MM. Ethicism does not claim that every artwork, or even every narrative artwork, does contain moral features, only that when they do, these impact on the aesthetic value of the works to some extent.
As previously noted, not only do the arguments for MM and ethicism differ in scope, but they also differ in detail; and in the detail of each arguments there are possible flaws. A possible difficulty with MM – a difficulty that Oliver Conolly identifies – lies in its reliance on the notion of an’ideal’, or ‘morally sensitive’ audience – the normative element in MM. (See Conolly, ‘Ethicism & Moderate Moralism, BJA, 40:3, 2000)
Carroll wants to make clear that his ‘ideal sensitive viewer’ is not one who simply makes “whatever the work has to offer inaccessible to himself because it at first offends their moral sensibilities”. He explains that “the reluctance that the moderate moralist has in mind is not that the ideally sensitive audience member voluntarily puts on the brakes; rather, it is that he can’t depress the accelerator because it is jammed. He tries, but fails. And he fails because there is something wrong with the structure of the artwork. It has not been designed properly on its own terms.” (Carroll, 2000, p. 378) This appears to avoid the objection that ‘morally sensitive audiences’ will simply impose their own moral views on artworks. However, even with this clarification, the notion of an’ideal’ or, ‘morally sensitive’, audience still seems problematic.
Conolly suggests that there are four possible interpretations of MM; Optimistic Instrumental MM, Ideal-Spectator Instrumental MM, Standard Instrumental MM and Standard Intrinsic MM. According to Optimistic Instrumental MM, “moral virtues always happen to lead to greater audience-absorption, owing to a uniformly moral audience.”(Conolly, 2000, p. 308) This interpretation of MM is not only far too optimistic, but also explicitly rejected by Carroll, who distinguishes his ‘morally sensitive audiences’ from actual audiences, saying, “sometimes actual audiences may fail to be deterred by a moral defect in a work because, given the circumstances, they are not as morally sensitive as they should be…”(Carroll, 2000 p. 378) He gives the example of an audience during the midst of war. This clarification also avoids the problem of explaining the moral and aesthetic value of artworks simply in terms of popular opinion. Hence, the appeal to the normative notion of an ideal audience, rather than actual audiences avoids relativism. However, Conolly points out that MM’s reliance on this normative element leads to a collapse of MM into ethicism. According to Ideal Spectator MM, “[i]f only ideally moral audiences count, then … it follows that all moral virtues / defects are also aesthetic virtues / defects.” (Conolly, 2000, p. 306) Conolly explains that “[t]his is because ‘morally sensitive audiences’ will always react favourably to moral virtue and unfavourably to moral vice. That, one takes it, is what makes them morally sensitive.”(p. 306) Conolly goes on to argue that the two other possible interpretations of MM are wrong, but I will not follow him there. The central point is that, to the extent that it relies on the notion of the ideal audience, MM collapses into ethicism, because in actual fact moral features (merits or defects) will always be aesthetic features also (merits or defects). However, it should be noted that MM’s reliance on ‘ideal’ or ‘morally sensitive’ audiences means that Carroll doesn’t specify particular criteria upon which to base judgments about the moral defectiveness or moral virtue of artworks, but his position is compatible with such criteria, which would render the ideal audience redundant.
However, although there are valuable aspects to MM – in particular, the common reason argument has its merits – it nevertheless seems more plausible to claim, as the ethicist does, that the moral features of narrative artworks are always aesthetically relevant, i.e. they are always also aesthetic features in the sense that they impact to some degree on the overall aesthetic value of those works. One reason for this is that since MM states that moral features will only sometimes also be aesthetic features, there must be some moral features of artworks that are not aesthetically relevant, whereas no such category is required by ethicism. Carroll never explains what would distinguish a case in which moral features were aesthetically relevant from a case in which they weren’t – it seems only to be a question of degree – and I suggest that it makes more sense to simply say that moral features can impact on aesthetic value to varying degrees.
I have previously mentioned that MM is more limited in scope than ethicism. Although he is not unsympathetic to Gaut’s view, Carroll attempts to show that ethicism is harder to defend than MM. Carroll claims that there is a problem with what exactly is built into the notion of an unmerited response. He says that according to ethicism “[a]ll immoral responses are alleged to be unmerited in a way that is relevant to aesthetic response.”(Carroll, 2000 p. 375) But Carroll questions this assumption by drawing an analogy with immoral humour. He argues: “if the ethicist means by ‘unmerited’ “unwarranted,” then the claim with respect to artworks that all prescribed, though immoral, responses are unmerited is false, since, like a joke, the structure and content of an artwork may warrant a prescribed response that is immoral. On the other hand, if the ethicist protests that by (aesthetically) ‘unmerited’ he means to include “morally unmerited,” then he can be charged with begging the question.”(p. 376) So, Carroll concludes, the ‘merited response argument’ can be criticised on the grounds that “not all ethically unmerited responses to artworks are unmerited aesthetically.”(p. 376) This objection can be challenged on Carroll’s own terms, since ideally moral audiences presumably would not find an immoral joke (for instance a racist joke) amusing, any more than they would find Triumph of the Will engaging, it can also be challenged on the grounds that laughing at a joke is not the same thing as judging an artwork to have high aesthetic value. Sometimes we laugh at ‘bad jokes’, such as pathetic puns, even while we recognise them as such. Likewise, we might be entertained by a ‘bad film’, such as ‘Revenge of the Killer Tomatoes’ or ‘Girl On a Motorcycle’, or other such cult films, while recognising it as such all the while.
While much of the recent research on ethical criticism has wrangled over what should and should not count as an aesthetic feature, a more commonplace concern about literary, or narrative, art and morality would be concerned with the possible effects those works might have on their audiences. For example, the popular Ben Elton novel Popcorn is a black comedy dealing with the issue of the effects of violent films portraying killers as attractive and powerful. However, it is desirable to keep causal claims about the harmful or ‘edifying’ effects of art at a distance when discussing the aesthetic relevance of the moral features of literary artworks. One of the main objections to ethical criticism made by radical autonomists is the anti-consequentialist objection that there is no evidence for causal claims about either the harmful or edifying effects of art. However, this objection assumes that ethical criticism is consequentialist, whereas it needn’t be at all. (A consequentialist version of ethical criticism would hold that the moral value of artworks, or certain artworks, was determined by that work’s actual effects on its audience. An expectational-consequentialist version of ethical criticism would hold that the moral value of art is determined by its likely effects on its audience.) If one rejects a consequentialist, or expectational-consequentialist, account of the moral value of art, then consideration of the effects (actual or likely) of literary artworks is a only matter for further consideration once the question of a work’s moral status has been decided; it is not relevant to the judgment of that work’s moral status. More work could certainly be done on the effects of artworks, however it is an area where empirical research would be required, and this is another reason causal claims have not figured highly in recent work on ethical criticism, although it should be mentioned that there is an imbalance is the extent to which positive and negative causal claims about the effects of narrative art have featured in this research.
Hence, it comes as no surprise that many of those who attempt to defend ethical criticism distance themselves from the causal thesis that morally bad art corrupts, and its counterpart, that art with high moral value morally improves its audience. Although most advocates of ethical criticism successfully avoid the negative causal thesis that bad art corrupts, many do in fact defend a version of the positive causal thesis that good art morally improves its audience. Thus, the negative thesis is avoided more assiduously than the positive, and the positive causal thesis has been more thoroughly developed. I think there are two main reasons for this. The first is that the negative thesis is not only more difficult to prove conceptually, but work in this area leads to fears about censorship of works deemed harmful. As discussed later, this fear need not preclude research on the negative effects of artworks, as the discovery that a work can have negative, or even harmful, effects on its audience does not necessarily entail that it should be censored. Another reason for the imbalance between the two sides of the causal thesis is that the positive causal thesis is more obviously relevant to discussions of the role, and value, of art in society.
It should be remembered that both the positive and negative sides of the causal thesis comprise a set of claims varying in degree. The strongest causal claims about art would be that bad art always corrupts its audience, while good art always brings about moral improvement; but any thesis this strong is intuitively implausible, and would be difficult to prove. The theses that bad art has the capacity to encourage immoral behaviour or attitudes in its audience, and that good art has the capacity to play an important role in our moral education (with the implication that these capacities may go unrealised) are rather more plausible. Martha Nussbaum has been the strongest advocate of the latter, while the former has not, to my knowledge, yet been fully explored. The following sub-section considers Nussbaum’s contribution to the ethical criticism debate, in particular with respect to the role that realist literature can play in moral education.
The ‘Ethical Criticism Symposium’, is a debate which took place, mostly within two issues of Philosophy and Literature, (Volumes 21-22) between Richard Posner on the one hand, who argued vehemently against the legitimacy of ethical criticism, and Martha Nussbaum and Wayne Booth on the other, who defended ethical criticism. Posner has already been introduced, and identified as at least a radical autonomist, and probably an extreme autonomist / aestheticist, or in other words, an aesthete. Against those who engage in ethical criticism, with a particular focus on Martha Nussbaum and Wayne Booth, Posner employs three of the most common objections to ethical criticism: autonomism / aestheticism, cognitive triviality and anti-consequentialism. However, Posner’s arguments rely on a narrow understanding of the ways in which literature can manifest moral features, and I will argue here that a broader moral context, such as that explicated in Nussbaum’s work on morality and literature, makes her claims about the moral value of literature plausible. Posner’s narrow understanding of moral knowledge and moral education mean that his criticisms of Nussbaum miss their mark. Nussbaum could be described as a moderate moralist (although her position is also compatible with ethicism) for although she never explicitly argues for MM, she makes two claims in her article “Exactly and Responsibly: A Defense of Ethical criticism”, in which her views are strikingly similar to Carroll’s ‘Common Reason Argument’:
Some of the main arguments against radical autonomism were presented earlier, and the position was shown to be an inadequate way of understanding aesthetic value, particularly the aesthetic value of literary art. Nussbaum, however, criticizes Posner’s autonomist position on more specific grounds, claiming:
Nor, it turns out, does Posner himself consistently hold the aesthetic-detachment position. Indeed, the role he imputes to literature in human life is clearly a moral one in my sense . . . Literature, he says, ‘helps us make sense of our lives, helps us to fashion an identity for ourselves.’ Reading a poem of Donne, he continues, won’t persuade someone who never thought about love that love is the most important thing in the world. But it may ‘make you realize that this is what you think, and so may serve to clarify yourself to yourself.’ That, of course, is what I have been saying all along. (p359)
Nussbaum is right to point out the inconsistency. As with the rather ironic quotation, in which Posner provides a moral justification for an extreme aestheticism (see section two), there are times when he uses moral discourse in his analysis of the aesthetic value of a work of literature – only he doesn’t seem to recognise it as such. There appear to be two main reasons why Posner objects so strongly to ethical criticism, and especially to Nussbaum’s employment of it. First, Posner’s understanding of ethics is very much a traditional ‘justice ethics’, and thus he is already at odds with Nussbaum, who’s understanding of ethics is somewhat broader. She says:
One can think of works of art which can be contemplated reasonably well without asking any urgent questions about how one should live. Abstract formalist paintings are sometimes of this character, and some intricate but non-programmatic works of music (though by no means all). But it seems highly unlikely that a responsive reading of any complex literary work is utterly detached from concerns about time and death, about pain and the transcendence of pain, and so on — all the material of ‘how one should live’ questions as I have conceived it. Thus, even with regard to works I don’t talk about at all — poetic dramas, lyric poems, novels by novelists very different from Dickens and James — the aesthetic-detachment thesis is implausible if we use ‘ethical’ and ‘moral’ in the broad sense that I have consistently and explicitly given it. (Nussbaum, 1998, p. 358)
Nussbaum’s understanding of morality is informed not only by Aristotle, but also by Iris Murdoch’s work, and by the insights of feminist moral philosophy.
Nussbaum’s main concern is with moral philosophy, and her interest in ethical criticism appears to stem from the desire to show the value and usefulness of a particular selection of literature to moral philosophy, and to the development of important moral skills. Thus, her perspective on ethical criticism differs from that of anyone who is approaching the topic with a central focus on aesthetics. However, Nussbaum recognises that literature can have many different purposes (1998 p. 347); she is merely pursuing one avenue. Among her responses to Posner’s criticisms, she makes explicit her specific purposes in the two books to which he refers:
Posner’s attack is directed at two very different works: Love’s Knowledge, where my primary concern is with moral philosophy, and with the claim that moral philosophy needs certain carefully selected works of narrative literature in order to pursue its own task in a complete way; and Poetic Justice, where my concern is with the conduct of public deliberations in democracy, and where my claim is that literature of a carefully specified sort can offer valuable assistance to such deliberations by both cultivating and reinforcing valuable moral abilities. In neither work do I make any general claims about ‘literature’ as such; indeed, I explicitly eschew such claims in both works, and I insist that my argument is confined to a narrow group of pre-selected works . . . (1998 p. 346)
Nussbaum goes so far as to say that is her contention that, “certain novels are, irreplaceably, works of moral philosophy. But I shall go further … the novel can be a paradigm of moral activity.” (1987 p. 170) Nussbaum’s central purposes for her selected literature are to demonstrate that this literature has a place amongst moral philosophy, and to argue that such literature has important role in moral education due to its capacity to help develop certain moral abilities.
Posner objects to the idea that literature should be used or interpreted as an extension of moral philosophy, and that it can contribute to moral education. There are two main objections; the first is that literature is not a unique or particularly good source of moral knowledge, the second that there is no evidence to suggest that certain literature can morally improve its audience. With reference to the former, Posner argues:
There is neither evidence nor a theoretical reason for a belief that literature provides a straighter path to knowledge about man and society than other sources of such knowledge, including writings in other fields, such as history and science, and interactions with real people. Some people prefer to get their knowledge of human nature from novels, but it doesn’t follow that novels are a superior source of such knowledge to life and to the various genres of nonfiction. (Posner, 1997, p. 10)
This objection is characteristic of those Carroll describes as arguments from cognitive triviality. (Carroll, 2000, pp. 353-355) The two main claims that make up this objection are; first, that “the moral theses associated with artworks are usually in the nature of truisms,” which “would hardly count as moral discoveries.”(Carroll, 2000, p. 354) And secondly, the claim made explicitly by Posner (above), that the knowledge (in this case, moral knowledge), imparted by artworks is not superior to (and some object that it is actually inferior to) that imparted by moral philosophy and the sciences. As Carroll notes, one way of countering this objection:
. . . is to claim that the model of knowledge employed by the skeptic is too narrow. The skeptic, albeit encouraged by the apparent practice of many ethical critics, thinks that the knowledge that is relevant to ethical criticism takes the form of propositions — propositions such as ‘that hypocrisy is noxious’ — and goes on to say that where such propositions are abstractable from artworks they are generally overwhelmingly trivial. But some ethical critics counter that there are more forms of knowledge than ‘knowledge that.’ (p. 361)
As an alternative to this narrow approach to the way in which literature may be morally informative, Carroll proposes the ‘acquaintance approach’ as an alternative, which is best summed up in the following paragraph:
It is one thing to be told that roadways in Mumbai are massively overcrowded, it is another thing to be given a detailed description full of illustrative incidents, emotively and perceptively portrayed. The first presents the fact: the second suggests the flavour. The first tells you that the streets are congested: the second gives a sense of what that congestion is like. The ethical critic, or at least some ethical critics, then, answer skeptics by first agreeing that the propositional knowledge available in art is often trivial or platitudinous; art is not competitive with science, philosophy, history, or even much journalism in supplying ‘knowledge that.’ But this is not the only type of knowledge there is. There is also ‘knowledge of what such and such would be like.’ . . . Moreover, this kind of knowledge is especially relevant for moral reasoning. In entertaining alternative courses of action, there is a place for the imagination. (p. 362)
This is a promising strategy, and one that is consistent with Nussbaum’s views. Nussbaum, again drawing on Henry James, tells us that moral knowledge restricted to propositions would be incomplete, what is needed is a broader understanding of moral knowledge: “Moral knowledge, James suggests, is not simply intellectual grasp of propositions; it is not even simply intellectual grasp of particular facts; it is perception, It is seeing a complex, concrete reality in a highly lucid and richly responsive way; it is taking in what is there, with imagination and feeling.” (Nussbaum, 1987 p. 174)
Nussbaum’s views are informed by the views of Iris Murdoch, as well as James, and one of the important features of Murdoch’s work Nussbaum draws on is the notion that our inner lives, our perceptions, self-awareness and so on, can be moral achievements. Speaking of Maggie, a character in James’ The Golden Bowl, Nussbaum says, “Her perceptions are necessary to her effort to give him up and to preserve his dignity. They are also moral achievements in their own right: expressions of love, protections of the loved, creations of a new and richer bond between them.” (p. 175)) The artistic conventions and stylistic devices available to the literary artist make it possible to represent our inner lives in a very full and realistic way, through the engagement of the audiences’ imaginations. Nussbaum suggests that there are some morally relevant aspects of our inner lives that can only be represented accurately through artistic representation:
I have said that these picturings, describings, feelings and communications — actions in their own right — have a moral value that is not reducible to that of the overt acts they engender. I have begun, on this basis, to build a case for saying that the morally valuable aspects of this exchange [between Maggie and Adam] could not be captured in a summary or paraphrase. Now I shall begin to close the gap between action and description from the other side, showing that a responsible action, as James conceives it, is a highly context-specific and nuanced and responsive thing whose rightness could not be captured in a description that fell short of the artistic. (1987 p. 176)
Thus, objections to the idea that literature can play an important role in moral education which are based on claims of cognitive-triviality are based on too narrow an understanding of moral knowledge. As Carroll argues, it is quite plausible to suppose that there are types of moral knowledge other than those which fall within a propositional model. Accounts of morality such as those proposed by Murdoch and Nussbaum, which emphasis the importance of our inner lives, provide obvious morally relevant subject matter, for which artistic representation is a highly appropriate means of communication.
However, the causal thesis Nussbaum proposes, that certain literature can help us to develop moral abilities, has not yet been fully defended here. Posner especially objects to the proposal that literature can morally improve its audience. His three main anti-consequentialist objections are; the importance of a good upbringing, literature loving Nazi’s and English professors who are no more moral than anyone else. (Posner, 1997 pp. 4-5) Nussbaum responds to this by clarifying the scope of her claims about the positive effects of literature, pointing out that:
I am fully in agreement with Posner that the phenomenon he designates as ‘empathy’ is not sufficient to motivate good action; I never suggest that it is, and early in Poetic Justice I insist that empathy is likely to be hooked up with compassion in someone who has had a good early education in childhood, one that teaches concern for others. (Nussbaum, 1998 p. 352)
And, with respect to the latter two points:
Booth and I are talking about the interaction between novel and mind during the time of reading. We do not claim that this part of one’s life invariably dominates, although we do think that if the novels are ethically good it will have a good influence, other things equal; nor do we claim that spending more time reading novels will make it more likely that this part will dominate. Moreover, reading can only have the good effects we claim for it if one reads with immersion, not just as a painful duty. (1998 p. 353)
Having thus clarified that hers is a moderate causal thesis about the possible positive effects of morally commendable literature, as one among many influences, Nussbaum’s position seems to stand up to Posner’s objections quite well. She only says that such literature can have morally beneficial effects, not that it will. Posner’s objections are not good ones; literature may have the capacity to aid in the moral education of those who are already predisposed to learn what literature specifically has to offer, but this does not mean that this capacity will always be realised. A novel’s full potential may not be realised all that often in ways other than the audience’s failure to see its full moral import; the novel’s fine stylistic features may also go unappreciated by many readers.
It now remains to consider the specific ways in which literature may morally educate. Carroll has some suggestions, which he collects under the heading, ‘the cultivation approach’. He explains that a further response to a skeptic such as Posner would be to:
…maintain that the skeptic’s conception of education is too narrow. For the skeptic, education is the acquisition of insightful propositions about the moral life. For the advocate of the cultivation approach, education may also involve other things, including the honing of ethically relevant skills and powers (such as the capacity for finer perceptual discrimination, the imagination, the emotions, and the overall ability to conduct moral reflection) as well as the exercise and refinement of moral understanding (that is, the improvement and sometimes the expansion of our understanding of the moral precepts and concepts we already possess). As the label for this approach indicates, the educative value of art resides in its potential to cultivate our moral talents. (Carroll, 2000, p. 367)
This is clearly in keeping with Nussbaum’s sentiments regarding the value of literature to moral education. What is required to make this causal thesis plausible is a departure from rigid views of the realms of aesthetics, morality and education. Rather, an account such as Nussbaum’s, which emphasises those important aspects of moral education which Carroll summarizes above, finds the common ground between ethics, education and literature.
It turns out that Posner’s criticisms of Nussbaum’s position are based on an understanding of morality, and moral education, which is too narrow. Posner’s conception of the aesthetic, and the value of art, is also too narrow; so narrow in fact that it misses some of the central reasons why we value literary art. Rather, it may be that the moral value of literary artworks is just one feature among many contributing to their overall aesthetic value, within a broad conception of the aesthetic, such as that proposed by Gaut’s ethicism. Nussbaum does not discuss what other aesthetic features might be relevant to an ‘all-things-considered’ judgment of aesthetic value, because it is not relevant to her primary interest. It is true that she takes certain literary works and uses them for a specific purpose which focuses on just one aspect of the whole aesthetic value of those works, but she says in her defense:
It is, of course, true that ethical and political considerations have played, and continue to play, a central role in my own literary projects. But one should not infer from this that I believe this is the only legitimate way of approaching literature — any more than one would rightly infer from the fact that a person makes a career of playing the clarinet that this person thinks the flute an instrument not worth playing. . . . In short . . . I am a pluralist about literary approaches, holding that there are many that deserve to be respected and fostered. (1998 p. 347)
Certainly this seems a healthy attitude. Respecting approaches to literature which have a specific purpose, such as Nussbaum’s work on the usefulness of literature to moral philosophy and moral development, can help us gain a more comprehensive understanding of the various reasons for which we value literary art, and the artists who create it.
Unfortunately, censorship decisions are often seen as being closely linked to judgments about the moral value of art. Censorship which restricts those art and entertainment objects available to us due to the imposition of a strict and rigid moral code is one of the great fears of the radical autonomist. However, the link between the moral value of artworks and censorship is often overemphasised. Although the ability to make judgments about the moral value, or perhaps even the effects of artworks, would sometimes be pertinent to informed, responsible decisions about censorship, judgments about the moral value, or effects, of artworks are neither sufficient nor necessary grounds upon which to base censorship decisions, since there are other relevant, and important, considerations.
To begin with, it has been maintained above that to judge a literary artwork as being morally problematic is not equivalent to judging that that work will have, or even could have, a corrupting influence on its audience; claims about the negative moral effects of artworks require a further step. As discussed earlier, causal claims about the effects of artworks, especially negative causal claims, are difficult to prove. But even if it could be shown that a particular artwork had the potential to corrupt audience members, it still does not automatically follow that that work should be censored.
There are, of course, issues of rights at stake; for instance the artist’s right to the freedom of expression, and the (mature) audience’s right to ‘make up their own minds’ about the value of particular works, as opposed to the public’s ‘right’ to be protected from corrupting influences and/or obscenity. There is a large body of literature which deals with the possible effects of pornography on society (this appears to have been researched far more than the possible immoral effects of artworks), on what exactly constitutes obscenity, and on issues of competing rights and responsibilities relevant to censorship. When one reviews the extent of this literature, it becomes clear that there are a great many issues to be considered with respect to censorship, of which the moral value of artworks is but one.
In fact, it is possible for partial censorship decisions, that is, restricted access rather than a complete ban, to be made without any reference to a work’s moral value at all. As discussed earlier, the strong causal thesis that certain artworks will corrupt their audience is implausible, given that at least some audience members may resist the corrupting influence of the artwork, and would be very difficult to prove; empirical as well as conceptual investigation would be required. It seems likely that the most we could be sure of is that a certain artwork had the potential to corrupt some audience members. The obvious next question is which audience members would be most likely to be affected. This is partly what is behind the film and television classification scheme; a kind of scaled censorship. The criterion here for the recommended restrictions on the audience is simply age. But the possibility that such works might morally corrupt some of their audience is not the only reason for classifying some such works as suitable for only an adult audience. More often the concern is simply that the issues raised by certain films or television programs are issues only a person of a certain age could properly grasp. Some films might be deemed too confusing, too frightening, or too explicit for a young audience’s comfort level, for instance, regardless of the moral status of those films. In these cases, a limited censorship is decided largely by judging what is appropriate for certain age groups, and this need not have anything to do with a work’s moral value.
This very brief comment on censorship is only intended to point out that although the ability to make sound moral judgments about artworks is sometimes relevant to censorship decisions, it isn’t always, and, furthermore, the judgment that a work is immoral is not sufficient grounds for that work to be censored; there are other pertinent issues to be taken into account. While a thesis such as this one could provide a starting point for further discussion on those censorship decisions which are based on judgments about the moral value of literary artworks, the issue of censorship is a substantial topic, which needs to be dealt with separately from the subject of the moral value of literary art.
Last updated: July 25, 2005 | Originally published: April/4/2004
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