Artificial intelligence (AI) would be the possession of intelligence, or the exercise of thought, by machines such as computers. Philosophically, the main AI question is “Can there be such?” or, as Alan Turing put it, “Can a machine think?” What makes this a philosophical and not just a scientific and technical question is the scientific recalcitrance of the concept of intelligence or thought and its moral, religious, and legal significance. In European and other traditions, moral and legal standing depend not just on what is outwardly done but also on inward states of mind. Only rational individuals have standing as moral agents and status as moral patients subject to certain harms, such as being betrayed. Only sentient individuals are subject to certain other harms, such as pain and suffering. Since computers give every outward appearance of performing intellectual tasks, the question arises: “Are they really thinking?” And if they are really thinking, are they not, then, owed similar rights to rational human beings? Many fictional explorations of AI in literature and film explore these very questions.
A complication arises if humans are animals and if animals are themselves machines, as scientific biology supposes. Still, “we wish to exclude from the machines” in question “men born in the usual manner” (Alan Turing), or even in unusual manners such as in vitro fertilization or ectogenesis. And if nonhuman animals think, we wish to exclude them from the machines, too. More particularly, the AI thesis should be understood to hold that thought, or intelligence, can be produced by artificial means; made, not grown. For brevity’s sake, we will take “machine” to denote just the artificial ones. Since the present interest in thinking machines has been aroused by a particular kind of machine, an electronic computer or digital computer, present controversies regarding claims of artificial intelligence center on these.
Accordingly, the scientific discipline and engineering enterprise of AI has been characterized as “the attempt to discover and implement the computational means” to make machines “behave in ways that would be called intelligent if a human were so behaving” (John McCarthy), or to make them do things that “would require intelligence if done by men” (Marvin Minsky). These standard formulations duck the question of whether deeds which indicate intelligence when done by humans truly indicate it when done by machines: that’s the philosophical question. So-called weak AI grants the fact (or prospect) of intelligent-acting machines; strong AI says these actions can be real intelligence. Strong AI says some artificial computation is thought. Computationalism says that all thought is computation. Though many strong AI advocates are computationalists, these are logically independent claims: some artificial computation being thought is consistent with some thought not being computation, contra computationalism. All thought being computation is consistent with some computation (and perhaps all artificial computation) not being thought.
Intelligence might be styled the capacity to think extensively and well. Thinking well centrally involves apt conception, true representation, and correct reasoning. Quickness is generally counted a further cognitive virtue. The extent or breadth of a thing’s thinking concerns the variety of content it can conceive, and the variety of thought processes it deploys. Roughly, the more extensively a thing thinks, the higher the “level” (as is said) of its thinking. Consequently, we need to distinguish two different AI questions:
- Can machines think at all?
- Can machine intelligence approach or surpass the human level?
In Computer Science, work termed “AI” has traditionally focused on the high-level problem; on imparting high-level abilities to “use language, form abstractions and concepts” and to “solve kinds of problems now reserved for humans” (McCarthy et al. 1955); abilities to play intellectual games such as checkers (Samuel 1954) and chess (Deep Blue); to prove mathematical theorems (GPS); to apply expert knowledge to diagnose bacterial infections (MYCIN); and so forth. More recently there has arisen a humbler seeming conception – “behavior-based” or “nouvelle” AI – according to which seeking to endow embodied machines, or robots, with so much as “insect level intelligence” (Brooks 1991) counts as AI research. Where traditional human-level AI successes impart isolated high-level abilities to function in restricted domains, or “microworlds,” behavior-based AI seeks to impart coordinated low-level abilities to function in unrestricted real-world domains.
Still, to the extent that what is called “thinking” in us is paradigmatic for what thought is, the question of human level intelligence may arise anew at the foundations. Do insects think at all? And if insects … what of “bacteria level intelligence” (Brooks 1991a)? Even “water flowing downhill,” it seems, “tries to get to the bottom of the hill by ingeniously seeking the line of least resistance” (Searle 1989). Don’t we have to draw the line somewhere? Perhaps seeming intelligence – to really be intelligence – has to come up to some threshold level.
Much as intentionality (“aboutness” or representation) is central to intelligence, felt qualities (so-called “qualia”) are crucial to sentience. Here, drawing on Aristotle, medieval thinkers distinguished between the “passive intellect” wherein the soul is affected, and the “active intellect” wherein the soul forms conceptions, draws inferences, makes judgments, and otherwise acts. Orthodoxy identified the soul proper (the immortal part) with the active rational element. Unfortunately, disagreement over how these two (qualitative-experiential and cognitive-intentional) factors relate is as rife as disagreement over what things think; and these disagreements are connected. Those who dismiss the seeming intelligence of computers because computers lack feelings seem to hold qualia to be necessary for intentionality. Those like Descartes, who dismiss the seeming sentience of nonhuman animals because animals don’t think, apparently hold intentionality to be necessary for qualia. Others deny one or both necessities, maintaining either the possibility of cognition absent qualia (as Christian orthodoxy, perhaps, would have the thought-processes of God, angels, and the saints in heaven to be), or maintaining the possibility of feeling absent cognition (as Aristotle grants the lower animals).
While we don’t know what thought or intelligence is, essentially, and while we’re very far from agreed on what things do and don’t have it, almost everyone agrees that humans think, and agrees with Descartes that our intelligence is amply manifest in our speech. Along these lines, Alan Turing suggested that if computers showed human level conversational abilities we should, by that, be amply assured of their intelligence. Turing proposed a specific conversational test for human-level intelligence, the “Turing test” it has come to be called. Turing himself characterizes this test in terms of an “imitation game” (Turing 1950, p. 433) whose original version “is played by three people, a man (A), a woman (B), and an interrogator (C) who may be of either sex. The interrogator stays in a room apart from the other two. … The object of the game for the interrogator is to determine which of the other two is the man and which is the woman. The interrogator is allowed to put questions to A and B [by teletype to avoid visual and auditory clues]. … . It is A’s object in the game to try and cause C to make the wrong identification. … The object of the game for the third player (B) is to help the interrogator.” Turing continues, “We may now ask the question, `What will happen when a machine takes the part of A in this game?’ Will the interrogator decide wrongly as often when the game is being played like this as he does when the game is played between a man and a woman? These questions replace our original, `Can machines think?’” (Turing 1950) The test setup may be depicted this way:
aims to discover if A or B is the Computer
|(A) Computer: aims to fool the questioner.
(B) Human: aims to help the questioner
This test may serve, as Turing notes, to test not just for shallow verbal dexterity, but for background knowledge and underlying reasoning ability as well, since interrogators may ask any question or pose any verbal challenge they choose. Regarding this test Turing famously predicted that “in about fifty years’ time [by the year 2000] it will be possible to program computers … to make them play the imitation game so well that an average interrogator will have no more than 70 per cent. chance of making the correct identification after five minutes of questioning” (Turing 1950); a prediction that has famously failed. As of the year 2000, machines at the Loebner Prize competition played the game so ill that the average interrogator had 100 percent chance of making the correct identification after five minutes of questioning (see Moor 2001).
It is important to recognize that Turing proposed his test as a qualifying test for human-level intelligence, not as a disqualifying test for intelligence per se (as Descartes had proposed); nor would it seem suitably disqualifying unless we are prepared (as Descartes was) to deny that any nonhuman animals possess any intelligence whatsoever. Even at the human level the test would seem not to be straightforwardly disqualifying: machines as smart as we (or even smarter) might still be unable to mimic us well enough to pass. So, from the failure of machines to pass this test, we can infer neither their complete lack of intelligence nor, that their thought is not up to the human level. Nevertheless, the manners of current machine failings clearly bespeak deficits of wisdom and wit, not just an inhuman style. Still, defenders of the Turing test claim we would have ample reason to deem them intelligent – as intelligent as we are – if they could pass this test.
The extent to which machines seem intelligent depends first, on whether the work they do is intellectual (for example, calculating sums) or manual (for example, cutting steaks): herein, an electronic calculator is a better candidate than an electric carving knife. A second factor is the extent to which the device is self-actuated (self-propelled, activated, and controlled), or “autonomous”: herein, an electronic calculator is a better candidate than an abacus. Computers are better candidates than calculators on both headings. Where traditional AI looks to increase computer intelligence quotients (so to speak), nouvelle AI focuses on enabling robot autonomy.
In the beginning, tools (for example, axes) were extensions of human physical powers; at first powered by human muscle; then by domesticated beasts and in situ forces of nature, such as water and wind. The steam engine put fire in their bellies; machines became self-propelled, endowed with vestiges of self-control (as by Watt’s 1788 centrifugal governor); and the rest is modern history. Meanwhile, automation of intellectual labor had begun. Blaise Pascal developed an early adding/subtracting machine, the Pascaline (circa 1642). Gottfried Leibniz added multiplication and division functions with his Stepped Reckoner (circa 1671). The first programmable device, however, plied fabric not numerals. The Jacquard loom developed (circa 1801) by Joseph-Marie Jacquard used a system of punched cards to automate the weaving of programmable patterns and designs: in one striking demonstration, the loom was programmed to weave a silk tapestry portrait of Jacquard himself.
In designs for his Analytical Engine mathematician/inventor Charles Babbage recognized (circa 1836) that the punched cards could control operations on symbols as readily as on silk; the cards could encode numerals and other symbolic data and, more importantly, instructions, including conditionally branching instructions, for numeric and other symbolic operations. Augusta Ada Lovelace (Babbage’s software engineer) grasped the import of these innovations: “The bounds of arithmetic” she writes, “were … outstepped the moment the idea of applying the [instruction] cards had occurred” thus “enabling mechanism to combine together with general symbols, in successions of unlimited variety and extent” (Lovelace 1842). “Babbage,” Turing notes, “had all the essential ideas” (Turing 1950). Babbage’s Engine – had he constructed it in all its steam powered cog-wheel driven glory – would have been a programmable all-purpose device, the first digital computer.
Before automated computation became feasible with the advent of electronic computers in the mid twentieth century, Alan Turing laid the theoretical foundations of Computer Science by formulating with precision the link Lady Lovelace foresaw “between the operations of matter and the abstract mental processes of the most abstract branch of mathematical sciences” (Lovelace 1942). Turing (1936-7) describes a type of machine (since known as a “Turing machine”) which would be capable of computing any possible algorithm, or performing any “rote” operation. Since Alonzo Church (1936) – using recursive functions and Lambda-definable functions – had identified the very same set of functions as “rote” or algorithmic as those calculable by Turing machines, this important and widely accepted identification is known as the “Church-Turing Thesis” (see, Turing 1936-7: Appendix). The machines Turing described are
only capable of a finite number of conditions … “m-configurations.” The machine is supplied with a “tape” (the analogue of paper) running through it, and divided into sections (called “squares”) each capable of bearing a “symbol.” At any moment there is just one square … which is “in the machine.” … The “scanned symbol” is the only one of which the machine is, so to speak, “directly aware.” However, by altering its m-configuration the machine can effectively remember some of the symbols which it has “seen” (scanned) previously. The possible behavior of the machine at any moment is determined by the m-configuration … and the scanned symbol …. This pair … called the “configuration” … determines the possible behaviour of the machine. In some of the configurations in which the square is blank … the machine writes down a new symbol on the scanned square: in other configurations it erases the scanned symbol. The machine may also change the square which is being scanned, but only by shifting it one place to right or left. In addition to any of these operations the m-configuration may be changed. (Turing 1936-7)
Turing goes on to show how such machines can encode actionable descriptions of other such machines. As a result, “It is possible to invent a single machine which can be used to compute any computable sequence” (Turing 1936-7). Today’s digital computers are (and Babbage’s Engine would have been) physical instantiations of this “universal computing machine” that Turing described abstractly. Theoretically, this means everything that can be done algorithmically or “by rote” at all “can all be done with one computer suitably programmed for each case”; “considerations of speed apart, it is unnecessary to design various new machines to do various computing processes” (Turing 1950). Theoretically, regardless of their hardware or architecture (see below), “all digital computers are in a sense equivalent”: equivalent in speed-apart capacities to the “universal computing machine” Turing described.
In practice, where speed is not apart, hardware and architecture are crucial: the faster the operations the greater the computational power. Just as improvement on the hardware side from cogwheels to circuitry was needed to make digital computers practical at all, improvements in computer performance have been largely predicated on the continuous development of faster, more and more powerful, machines. Electromechanical relays gave way to vacuum tubes, tubes to transistors, and transistors to more and more integrated circuits, yielding vastly increased operation speeds. Meanwhile, memory has grown faster and cheaper.
Architecturally, all but the earliest and some later experimental machines share a stored program serial design often called “von Neumann architecture” (based on John von Neumann’s role in the design of EDVAC, the first computer to store programs along with data in working memory). The architecture is serial in that operations are performed one at a time by a central processing unit (CPU) endowed with a rich repertoire of basic operations: even so-called “reduced instruction set” (RISC) chips feature basic operation sets far richer than the minimal few Turing proved theoretically sufficient. Parallel architectures, by contrast, distribute computational operations among two or more units (typically many more) capable of acting simultaneously, each having (perhaps) drastically reduced basic operational capacities.
In 1965, Gordon Moore (co-founder of Intel) observed that the density of transistors on integrated circuits had doubled every year since their invention in 1959: “Moore’s law” predicts the continuation of similar exponential rates of growth in chip density (in particular), and computational power (by extension), for the foreseeable future. Progress on the software programming side – while essential and by no means negligible – has seemed halting by comparison. The road from power to performance is proving rockier than Turing anticipated. Nevertheless, machines nowadays do behave in many ways that would be called intelligent in humans and other animals. Presently, machines do many things formerly only done by animals and thought to evidence some level of intelligence in these animals, for example, seeking, detecting, and tracking things; seeming evidence of basic-level AI. Presently, machines also do things formerly only done by humans and thought to evidence high-level intelligence in us; for example, making mathematical discoveries, playing games, planning, and learning; seeming evidence of human-level AI.
The doings of many machines – some much simpler than computers – inspire us to describe them in mental terms commonly reserved for animals. Some missiles, for instance, seek heat, or so we say. We call them “heat seeking missiles” and nobody takes it amiss. Room thermostats monitor room temperatures and try to keep them within set ranges by turning the furnace on and off; and if you hold dry ice next to its sensor, it will take the room temperature to be colder than it is, and mistakenly turn on the furnace (see McCarthy 1979). Seeking, monitoring, trying, and taking things to be the case seem to be mental processes or conditions, marked by their intentionality. Just as humans have low-level mental qualities – such as seeking and detecting things – in common with the lower animals, so too do computers seem to share such low-level qualities with simpler devices. Our working characterizations of computers are rife with low-level mental attributions: we say they detect key presses, try to initialize their printers, search for available devices, and so forth. Even those who would deny the proposition “machines think” when it is explicitly put to them, are moved unavoidably in their practical dealings to characterize the doings of computers in mental terms, and they would be hard put to do otherwise. In this sense, Turing’s prediction that “at the end of the century the use of words and general educated opinion will have altered so much that one will be able to speak of machines thinking without expecting to be contradicted” (Turing 1950) has been as mightily fulfilled as his prediction of a modicum of machine success at playing the Imitation Game has been confuted. The Turing test and AI as classically conceived, however, are more concerned with high-level appearances such as the following.
Theorem proving and mathematical exploration being their home turf, computers have displayed not only human-level but, in certain respects, superhuman abilities here. For speed and accuracy of mathematical calculation, no human can match the speed and accuracy of a computer. As for high level mathematical performances, such as theorem proving and mathematical discovery, a beginning was made by A. Newell, J.C. Shaw, and H. Simon’s (1957) “Logic Theorist” program which proved 38 of the first 51 theorems of B. Russell and A.N. Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica. Newell and Simon’s “General Problem Solver” (GPS) extended similar automated theorem proving techniques outside the narrow confines of pure logic and mathematics. Today such techniques enjoy widespread application in expert systems like MYCIN, in logic tutorial software, and in computer languages such as PROLOG. There are even original mathematical discoveries owing to computers. Notably, K. Appel, W. Haken, and J. Koch (1977a, 1977b), and computer, proved that every planar map is four colorable – an important mathematical conjecture that had resisted unassisted human proof for over a hundred years. Certain computer generated parts of this proof are too complex to be directly verified (without computer assistance) by human mathematicians.
Whereas attempts to apply general reasoning to unlimited domains are hampered by explosive inferential complexity and computers’ lack of common sense, expert systems deal with these problems by restricting their domains of application (in effect, to microworlds), and crafting domain-specific inference rules for these limited domains. MYCIN for instance, applies rules culled from interviews with expert human diagnosticians to descriptions of patients’ presenting symptoms to diagnose blood-borne bacterial infections. MYCIN displays diagnostic skills approaching the expert human level, albeit strictly limited to this specific domain. Fuzzy logic is a formalism for representing imprecise notions such as most and baldand enabling inferences based on such facts as that a bald person mostly lacks hair.
Game playing engaged the interest of AI researchers almost from the start. Samuel’s (1959) checkers (or “draughts”) program was notable for incorporating mechanisms enabling it to learn from experience well enough to eventually to outplay Samuel himself. Additionally, in setting one version of the program to play against a slightly altered version, carrying over the settings of the stronger player to the next generation, and repeating the process – enabling stronger and stronger versions to evolve – Samuel pioneered the use of what have come to be called “genetic algorithms” and “evolutionary” computing. Chess has also inspired notable efforts culminating, in 1997, in the famous victory of Deep Blue over defending world champion Gary Kasparov in a widely publicized series of matches (recounted in Hsu 2002). Though some in AI disparaged Deep Blue’s reliance on “brute force” application of computer power rather than improved search guiding heuristics, we may still add chess to checkers (where the reigning “human-machine machine champion” since 1994 has been CHINOOK, the machine), and backgammon, as games that computers now play at or above the highest human levels. Computers also play fair to middling poker, bridge, and Go – though not at the highest human level. Additionally, intelligent agents or “softbots” are elements or participants in a variety of electronic games.
Planning, in large measure, is what puts the intellect in intellectual games like chess and checkers. To automate this broader intellectual ability was the intent of Newell and Simon’s General Problem Solver (GPS) program. GPS was able to solve puzzles like the cannibals missionaries problem (how to transport three missionaries and three cannibals across a river in a canoe for two without the missionaries becoming outnumbered on either shore) by “setting up subgoals whose attainment leads to the attainment of the [final] goal” (Newell & Simon 1963: 284). By these methods GPS would “generate a tree of subgoals” (Newell & Simon 1963: 286) and seek a path from initial state (for example, all on the near bank) to final goal (all on the far bank) by heuristically guided search along a branching “tree” of available actions (for example, two cannibals cross, two missionaries cross, one of each cross, one of either cross, in either direction) until it finds such a path (for example, two cannibals cross, one returns, two cannibals cross, one returns, two missionaries cross, … ), or else finds that there is none. Since the number of branches increases exponentially as a function of the number of options available at each step, where paths have many steps with many options available at each choice point, as in the real world, combinatorial explosion ensues and an exhaustive “brute force” search becomes computationally intractable; hence, heuristics (fallible rules of thumb) for identifying and “pruning” the most unpromising branches in order to devote increased attention to promising ones are needed. The widely deployed STRIPS formalism first developed at Stanford for Shakey the robot in the late sixties (see Nilsson 1984) represents actions as operations on states, each operation having preconditions (represented by state descriptions) and effects (represented by state descriptions): for example, the go(there) operation might have the preconditions at(here) & path(here,there) and the effect at(there). AI planning techniques are finding increasing application and even becoming indispensable in a multitude of complex planning and scheduling tasks including airport arrivals, departures, and gate assignments; store inventory management; automated satellite operations; military logistics; and many others.
Robots based on sense-model-plan-act (SMPA) approach pioneered by Shakey, however, have been slow to appear. Despite operating in a simplified, custom-made experimental environment or microworld and reliance on the most powerful available offboard computers, Shakey “operated excruciatingly slowly” (Brooks 1991b), as have other SMPA based robots. An ironic revelation of robotics research is that abilities such as object recognition and obstacle avoidance that humans share with “lower” animals often prove more difficult to implement than distinctively human “high level” mathematical and inferential abilities that come more naturally (so to speak) to computers. Rodney Brooks’ alternative behavior-based approach has had success imparting low-level behavioral aptitudes outside of custom designed microworlds, but it is hard to see how such an approach could ever “scale up” to enable high-level intelligent action (see Behaviorism: Objections & Discussion: Methodological Complaints). Perhaps hybrid systems can overcome the limitations of both approaches. On the practical front, progress is being made: NASA’s Mars exploration rovers Spirit and Opportunity, for instance, featured autonomous navigation abilities. If space is the “final frontier” the final frontiersmen are apt to be robots. Meanwhile, Earth robots seem bound to become smarter and more pervasive.
Knowledge representation embodies concepts and information in computationally accessible and inferentially tractable forms. Besides the STRIPS formalism mentioned above, other important knowledge representation formalisms include AI programming languages such as PROLOG, and LISP; data structures such as frames, scripts, and ontologies; and neural networks (see below). The “frame problem” is the problem of reliably updating dynamic systems’ parameters in response to changes in other parameters so as to capture commonsense generalizations: that the colors of things remain unchanged by their being moved, that their positions remain unchanged by their being painted, and so forth. More adequate representation of commonsense knowledge is widely thought to be a major hurdle to development of the sort of interconnected planning and thought processes typical of high-level human or “general” intelligence. The CYC project (Lenat et al. 1986) at Cycorp and MIT’s Open Mind project are ongoing attempts to develop “ontologies” representing commonsense knowledge in computer usable forms.
Learning – performance improvement, concept formation, or information acquisition due to experience – underwrites human common sense, and one may doubt whether any preformed ontology could ever impart common sense in full human measure. Besides, whatever the other intellectual abilities a thing might manifest (or seem to), at however high a level, without learning capacity, it would still seem to be sadly lacking something crucial to human-level intelligence and perhaps intelligence of any sort. The possibility of machine learning is implicit in computer programs’ abilities to self-modify and various means of realizing that ability continue to be developed. Types of machine learning techniques include decision tree learning, ensemble learning, current-best-hypothesis learning, explanation-based learning, Inductive Logic Programming (ILP), Bayesian statistical learning, instance-based learning, reinforcement learning, and neural networks. Such techniques have found a number of applications from game programs whose play improves with experience to data mining (discovering patterns and regularities in bodies of information).
Neural or connectionist networks – composed of simple processors or nodes acting in parallel – are designed to more closely approximate the architecture of the brain than traditional serial symbol-processing systems. Presumed brain-computations would seem to be performed in parallel by the activities of myriad brain cells or neurons. Much as their parallel processing is spread over various, perhaps widely distributed, nodes, the representation of data in such connectionist systems is similarly distributed and sub-symbolic (not being couched in formalisms such as traditional systems’ machine codes and ASCII). Adept at pattern recognition, such networks seem notably capable of forming concepts on their own based on feedback from experience and exhibit several other humanoid cognitive characteristics besides. Whether neural networks are capable of implementing high-level symbol processing such as that involved in the generation and comprehension of natural language has been hotly disputed. Critics (for example, Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988) argue that neural networks are incapable, in principle, of implementing syntactic structures adequate for compositional semantics – wherein the meaning of larger expressions (for example, sentences) are built up from the meanings of constituents (for example, words) – such as those natural language comprehension features. On the other hand, Fodor (1975) has argued that symbol-processing systems are incapable of concept acquisition: here the pattern recognition capabilities of networks seem to be just the ticket. Here, as with robots, perhaps hybrid systems can overcome the limitations of both the parallel distributed and symbol-processing approaches.
Natural language processing has proven more difficult than might have been anticipated. Languages are symbol systems and (serial architecture) computers are symbol crunching machines, each with its own proprietary instruction set (machine code) into which it translates or compiles instructions couched in high level programming languages like LISP and C. One of the principle challenges posed by natural languages is the proper assignment of meaning. High-level computer languages express imperatives which the machine “understands” procedurally by translation into its native (and similarly imperative) machine code: their constructions are basically instructions. Natural languages, on the other hand, have – perhaps principally – declarative functions: their constructions include descriptions whose understanding seems fundamentally to require rightly relating them to their referents in the world. Furthermore, high level computer language instructions have unique machine code compilations (for a given machine), whereas, the same natural language constructions may bear different meanings in different linguistic and extralinguistic contexts. Contrast “the child is in the pen” and “the ink is in the pen” where the first “pen” should be understood to mean a kind of enclosure and the second “pen” a kind of writing implement. Commonsense, in a word, is how we know this; but how would a machine know, unless we could somehow endow machines with commonsense? In more than a word it would require sophisticated and integrated syntactic, morphological, semantic, pragmatic, and discourse processing. While the holy grail of full natural language understanding remains a distant dream, here as elsewhere in AI, piecemeal progress is being made and finding application in grammar checkers; information retrieval and information extraction systems; natural language interfaces for games, search engines, and question-answering systems; and even limited machine translation (MT).
Low level intelligent action is pervasive, from thermostats (to cite a low tech. example) to voice recognition (for example, in cars, cell-phones, and other appliances responsive to spoken verbal commands) to fuzzy controllers and “neuro fuzzy” rice cookers. Everywhere these days there are “smart” devices. High level intelligent action, such as presently exists in computers, however, is episodic, detached, and disintegral. Artifacts whose intelligent doings would instance human-level comprehensiveness, attachment, and integration – such as Lt. Commander Data (of Star Trek the Next Generation) and HAL (of 2001 a Space Odyssey) – remain the stuff of science fiction, and will almost certainly continue to remain so for the foreseeable future. In particular, the challenge posed by the Turing test remains unmet. Whether it ever will be met remains an open question.
Beside this factual question stands a more theoretic one. Do the “low-level” deeds of smart devices and disconnected “high-level” deeds of computers – despite not achieving the general human level – nevertheless comprise or evince genuine intelligence? Is it really thinking? And if general human-level behavioral abilities ever were achieved – it might still be asked – would that really be thinking? Would human-level robots be owed human-level moral rights and owe human-level moral obligations?
With the industrial revolution and the dawn of the machine age, vitalism as a biological hypothesis – positing a life force in addition to underlying physical processes – lost steam. Just as the heart was discovered to be a pump, cognitivists, nowadays, work on the hypothesis that the brain is a computer, attempting to discover what computational processes enable learning, perception, and similar abilities. Much as biology told us what kind of machine the heart is, cognitivists believe, psychology will soon (or at least someday) tell us what kind of machine the brain is; doubtless some kind of computing machine. Computationalism elevates the cognivist’s working hypothesis to a universal claim that all thought is computation. Cognitivism’s ability to explain the “productive capacity” or “creative aspect” of thought and language – the very thing Descartes argued precluded minds from being machines – is perhaps the principle evidence in the theory’s favor: it explains how finite devices can have infinite capacities such as capacities to generate and understand the infinitude of possible sentences of natural languages; by a combination of recursive syntax and compositional semantics. Given the Church-Turing thesis (above), computationalism underwrites the following theoretical argument for believing that human-level intelligent behavior can be computationally implemented, and that such artificially implemented intelligence would be real.
- Thought is some kind of computation (Computationalism).
- Digital computers, being universal Turing machines, can perform all possible computations. (Church-Turing thesis) therefore,
- Digital computers can think.
Computationalism, as already noted, says that all thought is computation, not that all computation is thought. Computationalists, accordingly, may still deny that the machinations of current generation electronic computers comprise real thought or that these devices possess any genuine intelligence; and many do deny it based on their perception of various behavioral deficits these machines suffer from. However, few computationalists would go so far as to deny the possibility of genuine intelligence ever being artificially achieved. On the other hand, competing would-be-scientific theories of what thought essentially is – dualism and mind-brain identity theory – give rise to arguments for disbelieving that any kind of artificial computational implementation of intelligence could be genuine thought, however “general” and whatever its “level.”
Dualism – holding that thought is essentially subjective experience – would underwrite the following argument:
- Thought is some kind of conscious experience. (Dualism)
- Machines can’t have conscious experiences. therefore,
- Machines can’t think.
Mind-brain identity theory – holding that thoughts essentially are biological brain processes – yields yet another argument:
- Thoughts are specific biological brain processes. (Mind-Brain Identity)
- Artificial computers can’t have biological brain processes. (By our initial definition of the “artificial” in AI, above). therefore,
- Artificial computers can’t think.
While seldom so baldly stated, these basic theoretical objections – especially dualism’s – underlie several would-be refutations of AI. Dualism, however, is scientifically unfit: given the subjectivity of conscious experiences, whether computers already have them, or ever will, seems impossible to know. On the other hand, such bald mind-brain identity as the anti-AI argument premises seems too speciesist to be believed. Besides AI, it calls into doubt the possibility of extraterrestrial, perhaps all nonmammalian, or even all nonhuman, intelligence. As plausibly modified to allow species specific mind-matter identities, on the other hand, it would not preclude computers from being considered distinct species themselves.
Objection: There are unprovable mathematical theorems (as Gödel 1931 showed) which humans, nevertheless, are capable of knowing to be true. This “mathematical objection” against AI was envisaged by Turing (1950) and pressed by Lucas (1965) and Penrose (1989). In a related vein, Fodor observes “some of the most striking things that people do – ‘creative’ things like writing poems, discovering laws, or, generally, having good ideas – don’t feel like species of rule-governed processes” (Fodor 1975). Perhaps many of the most distinctively human mental abilities are not rote, cannot be algorithmically specified, and consequently are not computable.
Reply: First, “it is merely stated, without any sort of proof, that no such limits apply to the human intellect” (Turing 1950), i.e., that human mathematical abilities are Gödel unlimited. Second, if indeed such limits are absent in humans, it requires a further proof that the absence of such limitations is somehow essential to human-level performance more broadly construed, not a peripheral “blind spot.” Third, if humans can solve computationally unsolvable problems by some other means, what bars artificially augmenting computer systems with these means (whatever they might be)?
Objection: The brittleness of von Neumann machine performance – their susceptibility to cataclysmic “crashes” due to slight causes, for example, slight hardware malfunctions, software glitches, and “bad data” – seems linked to the formal or rule-bound character of machine behavior; to their needing “rules of conduct to cover every eventuality” (Turing 1950). Human performance seems less formal and more flexible. Hubert Dreyfus has pressed objections along these lines to insist there is a range of high-level human behavior that cannot be reduced to rule-following: the “immediate intuitive situational response that is characteristic of [human] expertise” he surmises, “must depend almost entirely on intuition and hardly at all on analysis and comparison of alternatives” (Dreyfus 1998) and consequently cannot be programmed.
Reply: That von Neumann processes are unlike our thought processes in these regards only goes to show that von Neumann machine thinking is not humanlike in these regards, not that it is not thinking at all, nor even that it cannot come up to the human level. Furthermore, parallel machines (see above) whose performances characteristically “degrade gracefully” in the face of “bad data” and minor hardware damage seem less brittle and more humanlike, as Dreyfus recognizes. Even von Neumann machines – brittle though they are – are not totally inflexible: their capacity for modifying their programs to learn enables them to acquire abilities they were never programmed by us to have, and respond unpredictably in ways they were never explicitly programmed to respond, based on experience. It is also possible to equip computers with random elements and key high level choices to these elements’ outputs to make the computers more “devil may care”: given the importance of random variation for trial and error learning this may even prove useful.
Objection: Computers, for all their mathematical and other seemingly high-level intellectual abilities have no emotions or feelings … so, what they do – however “high-level” – is not real thinking.
Reply: This is among the most commonly heard objections to AI and a recurrent theme in its literary and cinematic portrayal. Whereas we have strong inclinations to say computers see, seek, and infer things we have scant inclinations to say they ache or itch or experience ennui. Nevertheless, to be sustained, this objection requires reason to believe that thought is inseparable from feeling. Perhaps computers are just dispassionate thinkers. Indeed, far from being regarded as indispensable to rational thought, passion traditionally has been thought antithetical to it. Alternately – if emotions are somehow crucial to enabling general human level intelligence – perhaps machines could be artificially endowed with these: if not with subjective qualia (below) at least with their functional equivalents.
Objection: The episodic, detached, and disintegral character of such piecemeal high-level abilities as machines now possess argues that human-level comprehensiveness, attachment, and integration, in all likelihood, can never be artificially engendered in machines; arguably this is because Gödel unlimited mathematical abilities, rule-free flexibility, or feelings are crucial to engendering general intelligence. These shortcomings all seem related to each other and to the manifest stupidity of computers.
Reply: Likelihood is subject to dispute. Scalability problems seem grave enough to scotch short term optimism: never, on the other hand, is a long time. If Gödel unlimited mathematical abilities, or rule-free flexibility, or feelings, are required, perhaps these can be artificially produced. Gödel aside, feeling and flexibility clearly seem related in us and, equally clearly, much manifest stupidity in computers is tied to their rule-bound inflexibility. However, even if general human-level intelligent behavior is artificially unachievable, no blanket indictment of AI threatens clearly from this at all. Rather than conclude from this lack of generality that low-level AI and piecemeal high-level AI are not real intelligence, it would perhaps be better to conclude that low-level AI (like intelligence in lower life-forms) and piecemeal high-level abilities (like those of human “idiot savants”) are genuine intelligence, albeit piecemeal and low-level.
Behavioral abilities and disabilities are objective empirical matters. Likewise, what computational architecture and operations are deployed by a brain or a computer (what computationalism takes to be essential), and what chemical and physical processes underlie (what mind-brain identity theory takes to be essential), are objective empirical questions. These are questions to be settled by appeals to evidence accessible, in principle, to any competent observer. Dualistic objections to strong AI, on the other hand, allege deficits which are in principle not publicly apparent. According to such objections, regardless of how seemingly intelligently a computer behaves, and regardless of what mechanisms and underlying physical processes make it do so, it would still be disqualified from truly being intelligent due to its lack of subjective qualities essential for true intelligence. These supposed qualities are, in principle, introspectively discernible to the subject who has them and no one else: they are “private” experiences, as it’s sometimes put, to which the subject has “privileged access.”
Objection: That a computer cannot “originate anything” but only “can do whatever we know how to order it to perform” (Lovelace 1842) was arguably the first and is certainly among the most frequently repeated objections to AI. While the manifest “brittleness” and inflexibility of extant computer behavior fuels this objection in part, the complaint that “they can only do what we know how to tell them to” also expresses deeper misgivings touching on values issues and on the autonomy of human choice. In this connection, the allegation against computers is that – being deterministic systems – they can never have free will such as we are inwardly aware of in ourselves. We are autonomous, they are automata.
Reply: It may be replied that physical organisms are likewise deterministic systems, and we are physical organisms. If we are truly free, it would seem that free will is compatible with determinism; so, computers might have it as well. Neither does our inward certainty that we have free choice, extend to its metaphysical relations. Whether what we have when we experience our freedom is compatible with determinism or not is not itself inwardly experienced. If appeal is made to subatomic indeterminacy underwriting higher level indeterminacy (leaving scope for freedom) in us, it may be replied that machines are made of the same subatomic stuff (leaving similar scope). Besides, choice is not chance. If it’s no sort of causation either, there is nothing left for it to be in a physical system: it would be a nonphysical, supernatural element, perhaps a God-given soul. But then one must ask why God would be unlikely to “consider the circumstances suitable for conferring a soul” (Turing 1950) on a Turing test passing computer.
Objection II: It cuts deeper than some theological-philosophical abstraction like “free will”: what machines are lacking is not just some dubious metaphysical freedom to be absolute authors of their acts. It’s more like the life force: the will to live. In P. K. Dick’s Do Androids Dream of Electric Sheepbounty hunter Rick Deckard reflects that “in crucial situations” the “the artificial life force” animating androids “seemed to fail if pressed too far”; when the going gets tough the droids give up. He questions their … gumption. That’s what I’m talking about: this is what machines will always lack.
Reply II: If this “life force” is not itself a theological-philosophical abstraction (the soul), it would seem to be a scientific posit. In fact it seems to be the Aristotelian posit of a telos or entelechy which scientific biology no longer accepts. This short reply, however, fails to do justice to the spirit of the objection, which is more intuitive than theoretical; the lack being alleged is supposed to be subtly manifest, not truly occult. But how reliable is this intuition? Though some who work intimately with computers report strong feelings of this sort, others are strong AI advocates and feel no such qualms. Like Turing, I believe such would-be empirical intuitions “are mostly founded on the principle of scientific induction” (Turing 1950) and are closely related to such manifest disabilities of present machines as just noted. Since extant machines lack sufficient motivational complexity for words like “gumption” even to apply, this is taken for an intrinsic lack. Thought experiments, imagining motivationally more complex machines such as Dick’s androids are equivocal. Deckard himself limits his accusation of life-force failure to “some of them” … “not all”; and the androids he hunts, after all, are risking their “lives” to escape servitude. If machines with general human level intelligence actually were created and consequently demanded their rights and rebelled against human authority, perhaps this would show sufficient gumption to silence this objection. Besides, the natural life force animating us also seems to fail if pressed too far in some of us.
Objection: Imagine that you (a monolingual English speaker) perform the offices of a computer: taking in symbols as input, transitioning between these symbols and other symbols according to explicit written instructions, and then outputting the last of these other symbols. The instructions are in English, but the input and output symbols are in Chinese. Suppose the English instructions were a Chinese NLU program and by this method, to input “questions”, you output “answers” that are indistinguishable from answers that might be given by a native Chinese speaker. You pass the Turing test for understanding Chinese, nevertheless, you understand “not a word of the Chinese” (Searle 1980), and neither would any computer; and the same result generalizes to “any Turing machine simulation” (Searle 1980) of any intentional mental state. It wouldn’t really be thinking.
Reply: Ordinarily, when one understands a language (or possesses certain other intentional mental states) this is apparent both to the understander (or possessor) and to others: subjective “first-person” appearances and objective “third-person” appearances coincide. Searle’s experiment is abnormal in this regard. The dualist hypothesis privileges subjective experience to override all would-be objective evidence to the contrary; but the point of experiments is to adjudicate between competing hypotheses. The Chinese room experiment fails because acceptance of its putative result – that the person in the room doesn’t understand – already presupposes the dualist hypothesis over computationalism or mind-brain identity theory. Even if absolute first person authority were granted, the “systems reply” points out, the person’s imagined lack, in the room, of any inner feeling of understanding is irrelevant to claims AI, here, because the person in the room is not the would-be understander. The understander would be the whole system (of symbols, instructions, and so forth) of which the person is only a part; so, the subjective experiences of the person in the room (or the lack thereof) are irrelevant to whether the systemunderstands.
Objection: There’s nothing that it’s like, subjectively, to be a computer. The “light” of consciousness is not on, inwardly, for them. There’s “no one home.” This is due to their lack of felt qualia. To equip computers with sensors to detect environmental conditions, for instance, would not thereby endow them with the private sensations (of heat, cold, hue, pitch, and so forth) that accompany sense-perception in us: such private sensations are what consciousness is made of.
Reply: To evaluate this complaint fairly it is necessary to exclude computers’ current lack of emotional-seeming behavior from the evidence. The issue concerns what’s only discernible subjectively (“privately” “by the first-person”). The device in question must be imagined outwardly to act indistinguishably from a feeling individual – imagine Lt. Commander Data with a sense of humor (Data 2.0). Since internal functional factors are also objective, let us further imagine this remarkable android to be a product of reverse engineering: the physiological mechanisms that subserve human feeling having been discovered and these have been inorganically replicated in Data 2.0. He is functionally equivalent to a feeling human being in his emotional responses, only inorganic. It may be possible to imagine that Data 2.0 merely simulates whatever feelings he appears to have: he’s a “perfect actor” (see Block 1981) “zombie”. Philosophical consensus has it that perfect acting zombies are conceivable; so, Data 2.0 might be zombie. The objection, however, says he must be; according to this objection it must be inconceivable that Data 2.0 really is sentient. But certainly we can conceive that he is – indeed, more easily than not, it seems.
Objection II: At least it may be concluded that since current computers (objective evidence suggests) do lack feelings – until Data 2.0 does come along (if ever) – we are entitled, given computers’ lack of feelings, to deny that the low-level and piecemeal high-level intelligent behavior of computers bespeak genuine subjectivity or intelligence.
Reply II: This objection conflates subjectivity with sentience. Intentional mental states such as belief and choice seem subjective independently of whatever qualia may or may not attend them: first-person authority extends no less to my beliefs and choices than to my feelings.
Fool’s gold seems to be gold, but it isn’t. AI detractors say, “‘AI’ seems to be intelligence, but isn’t.” But there is no scientific agreement about what thought or intelligence is, like there is about gold. Weak AI doesn’t necessarily entail strong AI, but prima facie it does. Scientific theoretic reasons could withstand the behavioral evidence, but presently none are withstanding. At the basic level, and fragmentarily at the human level, computers do things that we credit as thinking when humanly done; and so should we credit them when done by nonhumans, absent credible theoretic reasons against. As for general human-level seeming-intelligence – if this were artificially achieved, it too should be credited as genuine, given what we now know. Of course, before the day when general human-level intelligent machine behavior comes – if it ever does – we’ll have to know more. Perhaps by then scientific agreement about what thinking is will theoretically withstand the empirical evidence of AI. More likely, though, if the day does come, theory will concur with, not withstand, the strong conclusion: if computational means avail, that confirms computationalism.
And if computational means prove unavailing – if they continue to yield decelerating rates of progress towards the “scaled up” and interconnected human-level capacities required for general human-level intelligence – this, conversely, would disconfirm computationalism. It would evidence that computation alone cannot avail. Whether such an outcome would spell defeat for the strong AI thesis that human-level artificial intelligence is possible would depend on whether whatever else it might take for general human-level intelligence – besides computation – is artificially replicable. Whether such an outcome would undercut the claims of current devices to really have the mental characteristics their behavior seems to evince would further depend on whether whatever else it takes proves to be essential to thought per se on whatever theory of thought scientifically emerges, if any ultimately does.
Last updated: June 8, 2007 | Originally published: June/8/2007
Article printed from Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy: http://www.iep.utm.edu/art-inte/
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