Mary Astell (1666-1731)

The English writer Mary Astell is widely known today as an early feminist pioneer, but not so well known as a philosophical thinker. Her feminist reputation rests largely on her impassioned plea to establish an all-female college in England, an idea first put forward in her Serious Proposal to the Ladies (1694). She is also remembered for her harsh but witty indictment of early modern marriage in her Some Reflections upon Marriage (1700). Underlying Astell’s feminist ideas, however, are strong philosophical foundations in the form of Cartesian epistemological and metaphysical principles. These principles play an important strategic role in her writings: to raise an awareness in women of their inherent ability to bring themselves to moral and intellectual perfection—to “pull themselves up by their bootstraps,” so to speak—regardless of their external circumstances. Toward this end, Astell urges her fellow women to embrace René Descartes’ “clear and distinct ideas” as the hallmarks of truth and certainty. In accordance with Cartesian rationalism, she teaches her readers that all knowledge can be founded on reason rather than the senses, and she urges them to practice Cartesian rules for thinking in order to attain knowledge of both moral and metaphysical truths. As a dualist, she encourages women to regard their souls as thinking substances distinct from their bodies and as capable of attaining mastery over bodily sensations and passions. In all her major writings, these philosophical themes are so prevalent that Astell might be justly regarded as one of the earliest feminist philosophers of the modern age.

Astell is an unorthodox Cartesian, however, insofar as she breaks from a number of Descartes’ classic doctrines, such as his theory of innate ideas and his views about the essence of the soul. And while Astell is indebted to Descartes’ ethical theory of the passions, her moral-theological viewpoint also closely resembles the Augustinian outlook of her English contemporary John Norris and the French thinker Nicolas Malebranche. As with these men, the intensely religious aspects of her thought cannot be ignored. The same deep religiosity permeates her political writings, and is arguably the main driver behind her critiques of the Whig philosophy of John Locke.

This article covers six key areas of Astell’s philosophy: her theory of knowledge, her metaphysics of mind and body, her philosophy of religion, her moral views, her feminist ideas, and her political thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Theory of Knowledge
  3. Metaphysics of Mind and Body
  4. Philosophy of Religion
  5. Moral Theory
  6. Feminism
    1. Education
    2. Marriage
  7. Political Thought
  8. Legacy
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Astell was born in Newcastle-upon-Tyne, England, on November 12, 1666, and died in Chelsea, London, on May 9, 1731. She was the eldest of two children born to Peter Astell and Mary Errington, both of whom belonged to respected Northumberland families with strong royalist leanings. The most important influence on Astell’s early intellectual development appears to have been her uncle Ralph Astell, a clergyman-poet who was educated at the University of Cambridge in the mid-seventeenth century. Under his tuition, it is likely that Astell gained a strong familiarity with Anglican theology. The works of a number of popular Anglican theologians can be found in the remains of Astell’s library, now held in the Northamptonshire Records Office. Through her uncle’s influence, she may have also become acquainted with the ideas of the Cambridge Platonist Henry More, an early adherent of Cartesian philosophy in England. Ralph Astell attended both St John’s and Emmanuel College in the 1650s, just as More’s career at Cambridge was taking off, and Astell later cites More’s writings in her works.

In 1678, Astell’s father died and her life trajectory took an unexpected turn. As a result of her father’s untimely death, Astell’s financial and social situation grew precarious: her mother had to borrow money to keep the family afloat, and it seems that they could never have afforded Astell’s dowry, even if she had wanted to marry. Though there were rumors that Astell had once been engaged to a clergyman, she remained unmarried and childless all her life, choosing instead to lead the life of a writer.

At some point, probably in the late 1680s, Astell made the bold decision to leave her childhood home and migrate to London, seemingly without any family support. Soon after her arrival in the city, she made the acquaintance of Archbishop William Sancroft; and then in 1689 she dedicated a book of manuscript poetry to him, out of gratitude for his counsel and assistance in her time of need. A few years after completing this manuscript, Astell turned her hand to philosophy. In 1693, she embarked on a correspondence with John Norris, the author of a series of popular religio-philosophical works called the Practical Discourses. Their letters discuss Norris’s appropriation of the moral and metaphysical ideas of Nicolas Malebranche, a French philosopher best known for his doctrine of occasionalism, the theory that God is the only true causal agent in the universe. Their correspondence continued for one year and was eventually published as Letters Concerning the Love of God (1695).

In the mid-1690s, Astell’s writing career began in earnest. In 1694, she published her first Proposal. A few years later, she followed up this original work with a second part offering a method for the improvement of women’s reason, heavily indebted to the ideas of Descartes and his followers Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole. Together with the Letters, the first and second Proposals made Astell something of a minor celebrity in London. She was publicly celebrated for her wit and eloquence, and openly commended by the likes of John Evelyn and Daniel Defoe. At the height of her career, Astell also had the support of several female benefactors of high social standing, including Lady Catherine Jones, Lady Elizabeth Hastings, Lady Ann Coventry, and Elizabeth Hutcheson. As a result, Astell was able to sustain her career as a writer, at least for a decade or so.

In 1700, Astell published her most popular feminist work, Some Reflections upon Marriage, a response to the scandalous marriage of Hortense Mancini, the duchess of Mazarin. Following this, her bookseller Richard Wilkin seems to have commissioned her to write several Tory political pamphlets. In 1704, she published three short tracts: Moderation Truly Stated, An Impartial Inquiry, and A Fair Way with the Dissenters. Then in 1705, Astell published her longest and most sophisticated work of moral philosophy, The Christian Religion, as Profess’d by a Daughter of the Church of England, a work that builds on the same feminist themes as her earlier treatises. In her final publication, Bart’lemy Fair (1709), Astell targets the third earl of Shaftesbury’s defense of free speech in his Letter Concerning Enthusiasm (1708).

After 1709, Astell did not publish any new works. But there is evidence that until her death she kept writing and also diligently editing her previous publications, not only her Christian Religion and Bart’lemy Fair (published in second editions in 1717 and 1720 respectively), but also the second part of her Proposal. In her later years, in keeping with her life-long interest in female education, Astell also took on the practical task of running a charity school for poor girls in her beloved neighborhood of Chelsea.

2. Theory of Knowledge

Astell’s guidelines on how to attain knowledge can be found in the second part of her Proposal (1697). In this work, Astell’s epistemological approach is distinctly rationalist insofar as she regards knowledge as founded on reason alone, and denies that sensory experience can be trusted as a reliable guide to truth. Her strict definition of knowledge is “that clear Perception which is follow’d by a firm assent to Conclusions rightly drawn from Premises of which we have clear and distinct Ideas” (SPL II 149). Like Descartes in his Principles of Philosophy (1644), Astell regards a perception as “clear” when it is accessible to the mind’s eye and the mind’s attention is firmly fixed on it. A perception is “distinct” when it is not only clear but also “particular” and distinguished from all other things. If an idea is both clear and distinct, then in Astell’s opinion we cannot withhold our assent from it (we cannot but affirm that it is true), without offending against reason.

Astell claims that we can attain knowledge by affirming only those ideas that are clear and distinct. To do so, we must learn to regulate the will, the mind’s active faculty of affirming or denying the ideas of the understanding. The will is to blame when we fall into erroneous judgements. We only really go astray because the will foolishly assents to more than it perceives; instead of carefully attending to the ideas of the understanding, it hurries on and makes rash judgments, beyond the scope of its ideas. We cannot successfully regulate the will, according to Astell, until we have learnt to moderate our passions or emotions. Certain emotions, such as pride and vanity, can prevent us from properly engaging in the search for truth. When we are faced with a truth that contradicts our mistaken idea of self-interest, for example, we shut our eyes against it and unreasonably refuse to entertain it.

Accordingly, in Astell’s view, a healthy disengagement from worldly things is an important first step toward the attainment of clarity and distinctness. Toward this end, in both her Proposals, she argues for the necessity of an academic retreat for women, so that they might withdraw from the hurry and noise of the everyday world (temporarily, at least) and focus their attention on nobler subjects. Importantly, she is not so concerned that women acquire knowledge for its own sake, but rather as a means for them to attain enduring happiness in both this life and the next. In her view, reason is the natural light that God has set up in our minds so that we might conform ourselves to his will and come to join him.

To attain both truth and happiness, a woman must follow reliable rules for thinking. Astell’s six rules bear a notable resemblance to Descartes’ own set of rules in his Discourse on the Method (1637), as well as those of his followers Arnauld and Nicole in their Logic, or the Art of Thinking (1662). She states that in any given inquiry, (i) we must acquire a distinct notion of our subject and a precise understanding of any key terms. Then (ii) we must avoid straying into any unnecessary or irrelevant subject matters, and conduct our thoughts in a natural, logical order. It follows that (iii) we must examine the simplest subjects first, before progressing to the study of more complex matters. (iv) We must take care to examine our subject thoroughly, according to each of its parts, and be sure not to leave any part unexamined. And (v) we must keep our focus firmly fixed on the subject at hand. (vi) Finally, and most importantly, we must not judge any further than we perceive, and we must not affirm anything as true unless it is incontestably known to be so.

In her later work, The Christian Religion, Astell deviates from Descartes’ epistemology by suggesting that the perception of truth is a participation in the mind of God (§262). In this respect, Astell comes closer to her unorthodox Cartesian contemporaries Norris and Malebranche, both of whom deny Descartes’ view that our ideas are innate, born within us, in our minds. Instead, her view has more in common with Augustine’s illuminationist theory that the human mind is capable of understanding ideas only by means of the divine light.

3. Metaphysics of Mind and Body

Astell’s argument for the soul-body distinction can be found in section 228 of her Christian Religion, embedded within a larger argument against Locke’s doctrine of “thinking matter.” Astell begins her critique of Locke with an inquiry about the nature of “the thing in us that thinks”: is it immaterial? Or could it be material, as Locke appears to suggest in his Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690)? In response, she points to the fact that the mind has entirely different properties and affections to the body, and that we can have a complete idea of mind as a thinking thing without considering it as dependent on, or related to, our idea of body as extended substance. But if we can have a complete idea of something in independence of a complete idea of another thing, she says, then those two things are really distinct. The mind and body are therefore distinct. Contra Locke, she says that we can affirm that the idea of thinking being excludes extension, and the idea of extended being excludes thought.

Like Descartes, Astell maintains that the human person is composed of two substances: the soul (or mind), which is a thinking thing, and the body, which is extended substance. However, she makes few explicit statements about how the soul moves the body (soul-body causation) or how the body causes sensations (body-soul causation). Some of her statements appear to suggest that she upholds an occasionalist theory of body-soul causation. According to a Malebranchean occasionalist, neither bodies nor souls have any genuine causal efficacy; only God has the causal power to bring about modifications in the human mind. In one passage of her Christian Religion, Astell suggests that God is the true efficient cause of all sensation, and she seemingly denies that material objects have any power to produce modifications in our souls (§378). These remarks, however, must be placed in the context of Astell’s response to Damaris Cudworth Masham, a Lockean philosopher who had vehemently attacked the Malebranchean moral and metaphysical ideals of the Astell-Norris Letters. In the passage in question, Astell’s main point is that even if we were to embrace those Malebranchean ideals without criticism, it’s not clear that they are as harmful to morality as Masham would suggest.

Other statements indicate that Astell holds an orthodox Cartesian interactionist position on soul-body and body-soul causation. In the Letters, she raises two objections to Norris’s view that God’s will is the only true cause of our sensations and that bodies are incapable of exerting a causal influence on souls. First, she points to the fact that if sensible objects are redundant features of God’s creation, as Norris suggests, then this offends against our idea of God as a supremely wise and perfect creator. Second, she points out that the existence of genuine secondary causes is more befitting of God’s majesty, because if such causes do exist, then he need not continually interfere in his own creation. As an alternative to occasionalism, Astell supports the view that there is a natural power, a “sensible congruity,” in bodies that enables them to cause sensations in the soul. In the second Proposal, Astell also takes an orthodox Cartesian stance by suggesting that the body is disposed to make impressions on the soul and that the soul has an active power to effect changes in the body.

Astell’s philosophical concept of the self as a thinking thing informs her feminist thought. She advises her fellow women that they must learn the value of proper self-love and self-esteem: the love and esteem of their souls and not their bodies. They must cease to live like animals or Cartesian machines, those purely material beings devoid of rationality; they must pursue what is conducive to their perfection as thinking, immaterial beings.

4. Philosophy of Religion

The Christian conception of God plays a crucial role in Astell’s wider project to bring women to the knowledge of the true source of their happiness. We can be assured, she says, that God always does what is best and most becoming of his infinite perfection; and so, we can be assured that the world and everything in it is created according to the eternal and immutable standards of rectitude. It therefore becomes women to live their lives in accordance with the law of God and reason—this is the surest route to their happiness.

Astell presents at least three different types of argument for the existence of God. In her second Proposal, she develops an ontological proof, an argument for God’s existence based on premises that can be known independently of experience. In the same work, immediately following this proof, she formulates a cosmological argument for the existence of God based upon empirical observations about the created world. In The Christian Religion, she once again takes a blended approach by presenting an ontological argument followed by a cosmological proof. Then in her final work Bart’lemy Fair, she offers yet another causal argument, this time based on the principle that a cause must have either the same or higher qualities than its effect.

In her second Proposal, Astell echoes the English translation of Descartes’ Meditations (1680) when she begins her ontological argument with an idea of God as “a being infinitely perfect.” She then asks the question: does this infinitely perfect being exist? Her answer is that, according to our intuitions, the idea of God and the idea of existence are compatible, because existence is a perfection and the necessary foundation of all other perfections (since what doesn’t exist can’t have any perfections). Moreover, if any being is infinite in all perfections, then we cannot deny that that being exists; therefore, we cannot deny that God, an infinitely perfect being, exists. In sections 7–8 of The Christian Religion, Astell strengthens this argument by asserting that an infinitely perfect being would have the perfection of self-existence, rather than ordinary everyday existence. She asserts that God could not derive his being from anyone but himself; if God had derived his existence from someone or something else, then he would not be supremely perfect. So, God must have ontological independence or self-existence; he must exist by his own nature.

A similar appeal to God’s ontological independence lies at the heart of Astell’s cosmological arguments for God. In the second Proposal, her argument begins with the idea of created or contingent beings. In her view, this idea naturally suggests to us the idea of “the power of giving being” to something. How were these contingent beings created? They cannot have had the power of giving being to themselves, because this would imply a contradiction; it would imply, that is, that they could both exist and not exist at the same time. The thing that created these contingent beings would therefore have to be self-existent. It could not be another created, contingent being because this would lead to an infinite regress of such beings. Yet an infinite regress without a last resort offends our basic intuition that something cannot come from nothing (ex nihilo nihil fit). It follows that there must be a last resort or a first cause: there must be a self-existent being who created those contingent beings—and this being is God. Astell presents a similar causal argument in her Christian Religion (§10).

In Bart’lemy Fair, Astell takes a different tack in order to explain why we must regard this self-existent being as the traditional theistic God. Here she implicitly appeals to the principle that a cause must have qualities that are similar to, or higher in perfection than, those contained in its effect. Her proof begins with the empirical observation that there is gravitation or “mutual attraction” between physical bodies in the created world. She then asks, how do we explain this phenomenon? If gravity is not an essential property of matter, then we must say that gravity proceeds from the will and power of a superior cause. But this superior cause cannot be material in nature, for that would imply that matter is superior to matter in general (a contradiction); so, the cause must be immaterial. This superior immaterial cause, moreover, must have the will and power to sustain mutual attraction between bodies. In short, this cause must be the theistic God.

5. Moral Theory

In terms of her moral approach, Astell might best be described as a Christian deontologist; in her view, all human beings have a duty to live in accordance with the law of God. Nevertheless, she is also a virtue theorist to the extent that she thinks that we ought to develop a disposition to obey the divine law, and developing this disposition requires us to cultivate virtue. These moral views can be found in all her works, but especially in her Letters, the second Proposal, and The Christian Religion.

According to Astell’s strict definition, virtue consists in the soul gaining mastery over the bodily impressions and directing its passions toward the right objects, in the right “pitch” (or intensity), according to the dictates of reason (SPL II 214). She warns that the bodily passions of love, hate, fear, desire, and joy can have a disturbing and disquieting effect on the human mind. When we are in the thrall of such passions, we can get carried away and zealously pursue the wrong objects, often to our moral and spiritual destruction. The proper regulation of the passions thus plays an important role in the attainment of virtue.

Astell thinks that the passions need not be obstacles on the path to virtue, provided that they are “hallowed” or purified in some way. As a long-term strategy toward purification, we should meditate carefully on what is truly good and truly bad, and follow only those moral judgements that proceed from knowledge. Crucial to this endeavor, we must learn to focus our attention on the right objects, including our own nature as thinking things, the true nature of material beings, and the nature of an infinitely perfect being. Moral agents often go astray, according to Astell, because they have mistaken or erroneous judgements about the nature and value of these objects.

There are a number of virtues (excellences of character) that feature prominently in Astell’s moral theory; the most significant are benevolence, generosity, and friendship. Benevolence is a wishing well toward others purely for the sake of promoting their well-being, and not for selfish motives. In her writings, the love of benevolence is often contrasted with the love of desire, a selfish egoistic kind of love for others, in which we desire to possess them. On this topic, her views have much in common with the Augustinian outlook of her correspondent John Norris. Like Norris, she maintains that a virtuous agent has properly ordered love. In their Letters, they agree that human beings ought to cultivate an exclusive love of desire for God, an infinitely perfect being, because he is the only being who is truly capable of satisfying our desire. Toward our fellow human beings, we should feel only a love of benevolence; we should cultivate a disinterested goodwill rather than a selfish desire. Unlike Norris, Astell emphasizes that an exclusive desire for God can have the added benefit of helping us to regulate our passions and cultivate a non-possessive attitude toward others.

In Astell’s view, the virtue of generosity (or having “a generous soul” and “a generous temper”) also provides a remedy for our selfish desires. Like Descartes in his Passions of the Soul (1649), she regards the virtue of generosity as a species of self-esteem, a valuing ourselves on the basis of some noble or worthy characteristic. More than this, generosity consists in recognizing that our moral worth consists in exercising our free will, plus a firm commitment always to do our best. Those who have the virtue of generosity eventually cease to desire the approbation of others, because they do not really care what the rest of the world thinks of their choices and actions. So long as they themselves always endeavor to do what is best in their own minds, they are impervious to censure and ridicule.

The difficulty for women, Astell says in her second Proposal, is that they have been culturally conditioned to value themselves on accidental properties such as their looks and their clothing. They have acquired a mistaken sense of self-esteem because they have not been encouraged to value themselves as rational, thinking beings with freedom of will. To cultivate justified self-esteem, according to Astell, women must be permitted to train their reason and to study philosophy and religion. She thinks that Christianity in particular facilitates the cultivation of generosity, because it teaches them that what is truly valuable does not depend on the transient things of this world.

Finally, the virtue of friendship (a species of the love of benevolence) plays an important role in Astell’s moral thought. In her view, one of the chief benefits of her female academy is that it will enable virtuous friendships to flourish among women. These friends will then watch over each other’s moral and intellectual advancement, with the aim of advising and encouraging each other toward perfection.

6. Feminism

a. Education

Astell’s first Proposal is essentially an exercise in consciousness-raising, for the purpose of bringing about the moral and intellectual reformation of early modern women. The “proposal” of Astell’s title is an all-female academic institute, where like-minded scholars of a similar age and social status might live and study together for a number of years. Although a wealthy gentlewoman expressed interest in funding Astell’s proposal, an academy never materialized in her lifetime—possibly due to the suspicion that it sounded like a Catholic nunnery.

Throughout her works, Astell appeals to different philosophical ideas to argue that women should receive a higher education, and to undermine the belief that women are naturally intellectually inferior to men. These ideas include an egalitarian conception of reason, the Cartesian concept of the thinking self, and certain teleological principles.

To challenge the idea that women are mentally inferior, Astell’s historical predecessors traditionally pointed to empirical evidence or famous instances of exemplary women. By contrast, Astell appeals only to an inward consciousness of thought. In her view, the fact that women are thinking things needs no proof or argument; a woman simply has to turn within herself and see that she is capable of exercising her mental faculties. Astell emphasizes that the search for knowledge does not require the mastery of languages, such as Greek and Latin, nor does it require an extensive library or an intimate acquaintance with ancient authorities and obscure terminology. It simply requires the capacity to discern the truth for oneself, and the freedom to affirm or deny the ideas of the mind. In terms of their capacity for rational judgement, Astell says, women are no different to men; they are on a par.

While Astell never articulates the cogito (Descartes’ famous insight that “I think therefore I am”), she does rely on a similar logic. She relies on the idea that if a woman is capable of entertaining a thought in her mind, then it is true that she thinks; it cannot be denied. To improve their reason, according to Astell, women need only familiarize themselves with their own internal “natural logic.” Can they reason about the everyday management of household affairs, can they make informed judgments about the course of a romance or the design of a petticoat? If so, then this provides indisputable evidence of their ability to reason. If women exhibit any defect in reasoning, Astell says, this defect is acquired rather than natural, and can be corrected through proper training and meditation. They can improve their reasoning skills by following simple Cartesian rules for thinking (see the “Theory of Knowledge” section above).

It should be noted that Astell differs from Descartes in emphasizing that we can never have a distinct idea of the self as a thing whose essence consists solely in thinking (SPL II 173). She also differs from Descartes by appealing to God’s final causality in order to bolster her arguments for women’s education. In her writings, she repeatedly emphasizes that an infinitely perfect being does nothing in vain; there can be no feature of his intelligent design that is redundant or superfluous in nature. It follows that if God has bestowed rational minds upon women, then they ought to be permitted to use their minds toward the best ends. When a woman is taught that her duty is to serve a man, or to live a life devoted solely to bodily and material concerns, she is taught to disregard her sacred duty to God. A woman must therefore be educated to use her reason to raise herself toward perfection, just as her creator intended.

b. Marriage

In Some Reflections upon Marriage, Astell examines women’s disadvantages within the early modern marriage state. This work was ostensibly a response to Hortense Mancini’s much-publicized separation from her abusive and unstable husband, the duke of Meilleraye.  Although Astell regards marriage as a sacred institution ordained by God, she complains that in her day it has greatly degenerated from its original blessed state. In the Reflections, her explicit purpose is to analyze why this degeneration has occurred and to see how it might be rectified. She traces the core problem to the moral failings of human beings—but to the failings of men in particular. She highlights the fact that most men do not marry from a love of benevolence toward women but rather from base and selfish motives, such as lust and greed. Marriage would be a happy state today, she insists, if only human beings were guided by their reason and not by brutish passions. Astell warns her fellow women to be extremely wary of entering into marriage in the first place. She points to the fact that a wife is expected to offer blind submission to her husband, even when he does not deserve it. This expectation of submission might lead a woman to ignore the dictates of her reason, the law of God, and to act in terms of worldly self-interest instead. As a result, an unhappy marriage to a vicious man could lead to the destruction of a woman’s soul. As a remedy, Astell once again highlights the necessity of a good education for women, to fortify their reason and to cultivate their virtue. If Mancini had had the benefit of a higher education in philosophy and religion, Astell suggests, her husband’s abuse might not have led to her moral degradation.

Some scholars propose that Astell’s Reflections contains a hidden political sub-text. More specifically, they interpret the work in light of Astell’s conservative Anglican Tory political commitments.  In their view, when Astell highlights female slavery within marriage—when she asks her famous question, “if all Men are born free, how is it that all Women are born slaves?” (RM 18)—she is really presenting an ironic challenge to Whig theorists of her time. They claim that she challenges her Whig opponents to extend the same authority to sovereigns in the state that they uncritically permit to husbands in the domestic sphere. If submission and obedience to authority is acceptable in the family home, she asks, then why not in the state? Whig theorists, such as Locke, ought to practice the same obedience to their political leaders that they exact from their domestic subjects—they ought to practice passive obedience.

7. Political Thought

Astell has been widely interpreted as a critic of Locke’s political thought and as a vocal opponent of the Whig theories of liberty, toleration, and resistance. For some commentators, it is puzzling that Astell could be both a feminist and a High-Church Tory. At first glance, her support for women’s freedom of judgement seems to be incompatible with her support for a political party that opposes freedom of conscience, a tolerationist ethic, and other perceived threats to the Anglican church. To dispel these tensions, scholars have highlighted the fact that Astell’s feminism is founded on philosophical principles, not progressive political ideals, and this partly explains why Astell does not call for full political equality for women in her time.

In keeping with Anglican political theology, Astell maintains that all subjects are bound to observe the doctrine of passive obedience, the idea that subjects must actively obey political authority where they can, and quietly submit to the penalty for disobedience where they cannot (in those cases, for example, where the authority commands something sinful or irreligious). In her view, political subjects are never justified in engaging in active resistance to the crown, even if the crown wields a tyrannical, arbitrary power. These commitments lead Astell to criticize Locke’s views concerning the natural law of self-preservation and the right of resistance in his Two Treatises (1689).

In Locke’s view, every man has an equal right to freedom from arbitrary power. In the natural state, whenever another man threatens to enslave me, I have the right to resist him in order to preserve my life, liberty, and property. In civil society, a political authority is set up to ensure the preservation of my life, liberty, and property; but if that authority fails to act for the public good, and wields a tyrannical, arbitrary power instead, I can still exercise my right of resistance, as an extension of the natural law of self-preservation. I can depose that authority by force, if need be.

In response, in her Christian Religion (§274), Astell agrees with Locke that self-preservation is a fundamental right. But in her view, strictly speaking self-preservation consists in the preservation of the immaterial, immortal soul; so, according to the natural law, we are only ever permitted to act to secure our souls from damnation. From her Anglican viewpoint, soul-preservation entails passive obedience, not active resistance.

8. Legacy

In her lifetime, Astell’s writings were known to the philosophers John Locke, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, and George Berkeley. But her ideas seem to have had the greatest impact on other eighteenth-century defenders of women, such as Mary Chudleigh, Elizabeth Thomas, the writer known as “Eugenia,” Mary Wortley Montagu, and Sarah Chapone. Her influence as a feminist can be discerned right up to the suffragist movement of the late nineteenth century, especially in the writings of English suffragette Harriett McIlquham. In recent history, there have been two revivals of academic interest in Astell as a feminist: the first from the 1890s to the early twentieth century; and the second from the mid-1980s to the present day, facilitated to a great extent by Ruth Perry’s authoritative biography, The Celebrated Mary Astell. Perry claims that Astell would be surprised at the history of her reception as feminist pioneer—Astell thought of herself more as a metaphysician and philosopher than a political reformer.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Astell, Mary, Bart’lemy Fair: Or, An Enquiry after Wit; In which due Respect is had to a Letter Concerning Enthusiasm, To my LORD ***, London: Richard Wilkin, 1709.
    • Astell’s moral-theological critique of Whig political ideas in Shaftesbury’s Letter. No modern edition currently exists.
  • Astell, Mary, Astell: Political Writings, ed. Patricia Springborg, Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • Contains the third edition of Reflections on Marriage (1706), cited in the text as RM.
  • Astell, Mary, A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Parts I and II, ed. Patricia Springborg, Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press, 2002.
    • Standard modern edition of Astell’s best-known work. Cited in the text as SPL part, page.
  • Astell, Mary, and John Norris, Letters Concerning the Love of God, ed. E. Derek Taylor and Melvyn New, Aldershot, UK: Ashgate, 2005.
    • Modern edition of Astell’s correspondence with the Malebranchean philosopher John Norris.
  • Astell, Mary, The Christian Religion, as Professed by a Daughter of the Church of England, ed. Jacqueline Broad, The Other Voice in Early Modern Europe: Toronto Series, Toronto, ON: Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies and Iter Publishing, 2013.
    • Modern edition of Astell’s most mature work of moral theology, based on 1717 second edition. Cited in the text by section number.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Boyle, Deborah, “Mary Astell and Cartesian ‘Scientia’,” in Judy Hayden, ed., The New Science and Women’s Literary Discourse: Prefiguring Frankenstein, New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2011, 99–112.
    • Account of Astell’s theory of knowledge and her distinction between faith, science, and opinion.
  • Broad, Jacqueline, The Philosophy of Mary Astell: An Early Modern Theory of Virtue, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2015.
    • First book-length examination of Astell’s wider philosophy. Presented from the point of view of her ethical theory.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, “Custom, Freedom and Equality: Mary Astell on Marriage and Women’s Education,” in Alice Sowaal and Penny A. Weiss, eds., Feminist Interpretations of Mary Astell, Re-reading the Canon, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2016, 74-92.
    • Examines Astell’s Cartesian epistemology with a focus on dispelling tensions within her feminism.
  • Goldie, Mark, “Mary Astell and John Locke,” in William Kolbrener and Michal Michelson, eds., Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, Aldershot, UK: Ashgate, 2007, 65–85.
    • Insightful analysis of Astell’s critique of John Locke’s religious and philosophical ideas.
  • Kinnaird, Joan K., “Mary Astell and the Conservative Contribution to English Feminism,” The Journal of British Studies 19, no. 1 (1979), 53–75.
    • Analysis of connections between Astell’s feminism and her conservative religious and political commitments.
  • Lascano, Marcy P., “Mary Astell on the Existence and Nature of God,” in Alice Sowaal and Penny A. Weiss, eds., Feminist Interpretations of Mary Astell, Re-reading the Canon, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2016, 168-87.
    • One of the first detailed discussions of Astell’s proofs for the existence of God.
  • Lister, Andrew, “Marriage and Misogyny: The Place of Mary Astell in the History of Political Thought,” History of Political Thought 25, no. 1 (2004), 44–72.
    • Interprets Reflections as a feminist work with the primary aim of urging women to remain single if possible.
  • Myers, Joanne E., “Enthusiastic Improvement: Mary Astell and Damaris Masham on Sociability,” Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy 28, no. 3 (2013), 534–50.
    • Provides insight into the so-called debate between Astell and fellow feminist Masham.
  • O’Neill, Eileen, “Mary Astell on the Causation of Sensation,” in William Kolbrener and Michal Michelson, eds., Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, Aldershot, UK: Ashgate, 2007, 145–63.
    • Interprets Astell as holding a Cartesian interactionist position on mind-body causal relations.
  • Perry, Ruth, The Celebrated Mary Astell: An Early English Feminist, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press, 1986.
    • The most authoritative and engaging account of Astell’s life and works.
  • Sowaal, Alice, “Mary Astell’s Serious Proposal: Mind, Method, and Custom,” Philosophy Compass 2 (2007), 227–43.
    • Analysis of Astell’s educational strategy in relation to her theory of mind.
  • Springborg, Patricia, Mary Astell: Theorist of Freedom from Domination, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • Interprets Astell’s writings in light of her support for the Tory political party and her High-Church Anglicanism.
  • Squadrito, Kathleen M., “Mary Astell’s Critique of Locke’s View of Thinking Matter,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 25, no. 3 (1987), 433–9.
    • Early article on Astell’s critique of Locke’s claim that God could conceivably add the power of thinking to matter.
  • Taylor, E. Derek, “Mary Astell’s Ironic Assault on John Locke’s Theory of Matter,” Journal of the History of Ideas 62, no. 3 (2001), 505–22.
    • Examines Astell’s critique of Locke with reference to Astell’s own views about the mind-body relationship.
  • Taylor, E. Derek, “Mary Astell’s Work Towards a New Edition of a Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Part II,” Studies in Bibliography 57 (2005–6), 197–232.
    • Provides evidence that Astell may have had plans for a new edition of her second Proposal (1697).


Author Information

Jacqueline Broad
Monash University