Hellenistic and Late Antiquity astrologers built their craft upon Babylonian (and to a lesser extent Egyptian) astrological traditions, and developed their theoretical and technical doctrines using a combination of Stoic, Middle Platonic and Neopythagorean thought. Astrology offered fulfillment of a desire to systematically know where an individual stands in relation to the cosmos in a time of rapid political and social changes. Various philosophers of the time took up polemics against astrology while accepting some astral theories. The Stoic philosopher Posidonius was alleged to embrace astrology and write works on it (Augustine, De civitate dei, 5.2). Other Stoics such as Panaetius and (late) Diogenes of Babylon were primarily adverse to astrological determinism. For some philosophers such as Plotinus, horoscopic astrology was absurd for reasons such that the planets could never bear ill will toward human beings whose souls were exalted above the cosmos. For others, such as the early Church Fathers, ethical implications of astrological fatalism were the main point of contention, as it was contrary to the emerging Christian doctrine of free will. The Gnostics, who for the most part believed the cosmos is the product of an evil and enslaving creator, thought of the planets as participants in this material entrapment. Prominent Neoplatonists such as Porphyry, Iamblichus, and Proclus found some aspects of astrology compatible with their versions of Neoplatonic philosophy. The cultural importance of astrology is attested to by the strong reactions to and involvement with astrology by various philosophers in late antiquity. The adaptability of astrology to various philosophical schools as well as the borrowing on the part of astrologers from diverse philosophies provides dynamic examples of the rich “electicism” or “syncretism” that characterized the Hellenistic world.
Astrology, loosely defined as a method of correspondences between celestial events and activity in the human realm, has played a role in nearly every civilization. Its role in the late-Hellenistic era is of special concern, particularly due to its complex interaction with Greek philosophy, as well as its claims on the life of an individual. A horoscopic chart (also “birth chart,” “natal chart,” or “horoscope”) is a list of planetary positions against a backdrop of zodiac signs, divided into regions of the sky (with reference to the rising and setting stars on the horizon) on the basis of one’s exact time and place of birth. Such charts form the basis of “natal astrology” or “genethlialogy,” which started in Babylon but was later developed in Hellenized Greek speaking regions.
The earliest surviving horoscopic chart pertaining to an individual is dated 410 B.C.E. in Babylon. Babylonian astrology flourished from the seventh century to the Seleucid era (late fourth century). However, astral religion and divination based on star omens have a much longer history in Mesopotamia. Stars were considered to be representations of gods whose favors could be courted through prayers, magical incantations and amulets. The triad of Anu, Enlil, and Ea corresponded not with individual stars or planets but to three bands of constellations. Traces of the basic characters of the planetary gods, such as the malevolent nature of Mars/Nergal (the god of destruction and plagues) and Venus/Ištar (the goddess of love), can be found in Hellenistic astrology. Given the small available sample of Late Babylonian horoscopic tablets containing planetary placements and laconic predictions (around 28 extant), it is very difficult to come to solid conclusions about the theoretical ground for the practice of the earliest horoscopic astrologers. The case will be different in the Hellenistic culture in which theoretical grounding was important for the development of the practice, and in which there is more extensive textual evidence.
Given the dynamic tension resulting from Greek philosophy meeting Egyptian, Babylonian, Persian and Jewish religions and ideologies, and the “syncretism” of cross-cultural influences, the Hellenistic era provided fruitful soil for the cultivation of what began primarily as a Mesopotamian system of celestial omens. Before Alexander’s conquest, the practice of astronomy and astrology in Babylon flourished but was not yet of much interest to the Greek thinkers. Babylonian priests/astrologers, notably Berossus, who settled on the island of Cos, are thought to be responsible for introducing astrology to Greece and the surrounding area. Plato mentions those who seek celestial portents in the Timaeus (40c-d), while the student of Plato who authored the Epinomis paved the way for application of astronomical studies to astral piety.
As the intellectual center in Egypt, Alexandria is a likely location for major developments in Hellenistic astrology. A portion of what Garth Fowden (in Egyptian Hermes) classified as “technical Hermetica,” material typically earlier than the “philosophical Hermetica,” represents a part of the early Hellenistic astrological corpus. Surviving Greek astrological writings, catalogued over a period of fifty years in a work called the Catalogus Codicum Astrologorum Graecorum (CCAG), reveal that for the sake of credibility, many of the Hellenistic astrologers attributed the earliest astrological works to historical or mythologized figures such as the pharaoh Nechepso, an Egyptian priest associated with Petosiris. Hermes is a legendary figure credited with the invention of astrology. Some fragments attributed to Hermes survive while some of the Nechepso/Petosiris work from the mid-second century B.C.E. survives in quotes by later authors. Asclepius, Anubio, Zoroaster, Abraham, Pythagoras, and Orpheus are additional figures having astrological works penned in their names. There are late Hellenistic references to three Babylonian astronomers/astrologers, Kidinnu (Kidenas), Soudines (the source of some material for second century C.E. astrologer, Vettius Valens), and Naburianos. The rivalry between the Seleucid and Ptolemaic kingdoms may be reflected in the astrologers’ varying attributions of the origins of astrology to Egyptians or Babylonians (called the Chaldaeans). Various astrological techniques and tables are either attributed to Egyptians or Chaldaeans, but by late antiquity, the source for specific techniques and approaches were often wrongly attributed. By the second century B.C.E., Babylonian astrology techniques were combined with Egyptian calendars and religious practices, Hermeticism, the Pythagorean sacred mathematics, and the philosophies of the Stoics and middle Platonists.
Hellenistic astrology displays the influence of a variety of philosophical sources. However, given the divergent and ever multiplying streams of thought in the Hellenized world, practical astrology did not necessarily conform to one particular philosophical model offered by the major philosophical schools. However, as outlined below, the Neopythagoreans, Platonists and Stoics provided the foundational influence on the development of the art.
After a system or systems of Hellenistic astrology quickly developed, the later practitioners and writers did not follow any one philosophical influence as a whole. In fact, the surviving instructional texts only scantily betray the philosophical positions of the authors. Vettius Valens, whose Anthologiarum is one of the most valuable sources for historians of this subject, indicates Stoic leanings. The astrologer, astronomer, and geographer whose work greatly influenced later development of astrology, Claudius Ptolemy (fl. 130-150 C.E.), using Aristotelian influenced manners of argumentation that had been absorbed by other Hellenistic schools such as the Middle Platonists and the Academic Skeptics, sought to portray astrology as a natural science, while dismissing a good portion of doctrine due to lack of systematic rigor. The later Platonic Academy had its fair share of astrological interest – head of the academy in the first century C.E., Thrasyllus, for example, acted as an astrologer to Emperor Tiberius and is credited for works on astrology and numerology. Neoplatonists Porphyry, Iamblichus and Proclus all practiced or accepted some form of astrology conforming to their unique contributions to Neoplatonism. It is difficult to imagine that the practice of astrology would have been divorced from philosophy by philosophers who were also astrologers. The idea of astrology, as a systematic account of fate, had a pervasive impact on the influential thinkers of the time who helped to shape the theoretical and cosmological understanding of the practice. Thinkers in the skeptical Academy and Pyrrhonic schools sought to attack the theoretical underpinnings of the practice of astrology, using a variety of arguments centering around freedom, the ontological status of the stars and planets, and the logical or practical limitations of astrological claims.
We now turn to the philosophies and philosophical schools of the Hellenic and Hellenized world that made the spread and acceptance of Babylonian astrology possible.
The role of Fate was often interchangeable with that of the gods in early Greek thinking. Fate implied foreknowledge, which was divine and sometimes dispensed by the gods. The intervention of the gods in human affairs also presented the possibility of two paths of fate, based on a moral choice. A decision that pleased or displeased the gods (such as the choice Odysseus must make regarding the Oxen of the Sun (Odyssey, Book XII) could set one off on a road of inexorable circumstances to follow.
For the pre-Socratic philosophers, personified powers – such as Moira (Fate or Destiny) Anankê(Necessity), Nemesis, Heimarmenê (Fate), Sumphora (Chance) and Tukhê (Fortune or Chance) – took on both metaphysical significances and personifications that blurred any distinction between the theological and the ontological. In thinkers such as Anaximander, Moira and Tukhê play a part in cosmology that exceeds and is possibly even prior to the gods. While the Olympian gods may be given foresight into the workings of Moira, they were often left without the power to transgress this transcendental dispensation of justice. Nature and the gods were both encompassed by Moira. At this time in Greek thinking, Fate and Fortune, and Zeus as its capricious dispenser, fell outside the pale of human understanding, for leading a virtuous life was no insurance of protection from material ruin. This sense of futility resulted in the pessimism of Ionian thinkers such as Mimnermus and Semonides. The attitude toward Moira and Tukhê by Archilochus is wholly pessimistic, for Moira and Tukhê were the sole dispensers of good and evil, with no possibility of mediation. We see the emergence of the question of the role of human responsibility in justice and injustice in early Greek thinking (that is, Solon), but it is unusual to see sharp distinctions between circumstantial Fate that dispenses good or evil and the human response to fate through virtue that was to later develop in Hellenistic thinking (such as found in the later Stoic position that happiness is self-control in spite of an immutable Fate). Theognis, however, offers a proto-Stoic forebearance of Fate and triumph of human character, while he expresses the frustration of apparent injustice in the dispensation of good to the wicked and bad to the innocent. Democritus reacted to skepticism based on the whims of Chance by favoring a causal determinism ruled by necessity (anankê). Attribution of events to Chance, he claimed, was an excuse for one’s lack of vigilance of the chain of causality (Fr. 119, Diels-Kranz). While not claiming such a thing as absolute chance, Democritus retained chance to indicate an obscure cause or causes.
We find in pre-Socratic thinking a stage set for the overcoming of the limitations of knowledge about the laws of the cosmos, not simply on a universal scale, but on the level of individual fortune as well. Hellenistic astrologers, in part, attempted to provide a complex astral logic to explain the apparent injustices of Fate. They attempted to fill this gap of knowledge and turn Chance and Fate into a predictable science for the initiated.
The development of Greek medical theory brought about a distinction between a basic “human nature” (koinê phusis) and an “individual nature” (idiê phusis). Greek medicine was motivated by the idea that nature has a unity and lawfulness. In the manner of Democritian Atomism, even Tukhê is causal, but not necessarily predictable. A Hippocratean would classify an individual’s psychophysical nature into one of four types based on the qualities of hot, cold, moist, and dry. Astrologers borrowed and elaborated upon the psychology and character typology found in early medical theory (cf. Manilius, Astronomica, 2.453-465; Ptolemy, Tetrabiblos, 3.12.148). In turn, astrology in the Hellenistic era was to in turn inform medical theory with 1) zodiacal and planetary melothesia (the association of astral phenomenon at birth with physical type), 2) iatromathematics (which included consideration of auspicious and inauspicious times), 3) sympathies and antipathies between healing plants and celestial bodies, and 4) prognostication of the course of an illness, of life expectancy or recovery, based on the moment a person fell ill. Melothesia and iatromathematics are found in the works of astrologers Manilius, Teucer (Teukros) of Babylon, Ptolemy, and Firmicus Maternus, as well as a variety of anonymous and pseudepigraphal works. (cf. Serapion, CCAG, 1.101-102; Pythagoras, CCAG, 11.2.124-138).
Galen’s own position on astrology was nuanced, for he rejected some aspects of astrological doctrine as it had been applied to medicine (particularly the Pythagorean numerology used in critical days, and the association of thirty-six healing plants with the Egyptian decans), while he supported other astrological considerations such as the Moon phases and relationship to planets for prognosis. Two of his works pertaining directly to this topic, On the Critical Days and Prognostication of Disease by Astrology. InOn the Critical Days Galen claimed an empirical basis for his selective acceptance, favoring astronomical accuracy (with fractional measures) over the Pythagorean doctrines in astrology (such as seven days per quarter cycle of the Moon). A passage in On the Natural Faculties (1.12.29) also alludes to his support of astrology in general and to a lost work on the physician Asclepiades where he dealt with the topics of omen, dreams and astrology. The context of the passage reveals that his theoretical acceptance of astrology is due to his Vitalist view of Nature (that the natural world is a living organism) as opposed to the Atomistic view of Nature (that all things are composed of inanimate atoms). Nature, for Galen (drawing upon the Vitalist position of Hippocrates) possesses faculties of attraction and assimilation of that which is appropriate (e.g., for an organism) and of expulsion of that which is foreign. Nature also provides the soul with innate ideas such as the virtues of courage, wisdom, temperance, etc. Omens and astrology are signs of Nature’s providence and artistry of the principles of assimilation and expulsion. The Atomist (Epicurean) school rejected astrology and divination by dreams and omens because they believed there is no causality and purpose in Nature, so there is no means of producing these “signs” or correspondences and no means of prediction by way of them.
Babylonian astrology was not wholly unknown to the Greeks prior to Alexander’s campaign. Plato, for instance, demonstrates an awareness of divination by the stars in the Timaeus dialogue, in which the protagonist criticizes divination by the stars without the means of astronomical calculation (logizethai) and a model (mimêmaton) of the heavens:
To describe the dancing movements of these gods, their juxtapositions and the back-circlings and advances of their circular courses on themselves; to tell which of the gods come into line with one another at their conjunctions and how many of them are in opposition, and in what order and at which times they pass in front of or behind one another, so that some are occluded from our view to reappear once again, thereby bring terrors and portents of things to come to those who cannot reason – to tell all this without the use of visible models would be labor spend in vain. 40c-d, Donald J. Zeyl translation, emphasis mine).
Each astronomical consideration listed in this passage, the conjunctions and oppositions, the occlusion or heliacal settings of planets and stars, the retrogradation are basic considerations in Babylonian (and subsequently Greek) astronomy. This passage may allude to early exposure of the Greeks to astrological methods more akin to numerology rather than based on astronomical observation, for the use of visible models can more accurately measure celestial phenomena. It may also be taken as evidence that Plato is at least aware of the Babylonian practice of omenic astrology or the horoscopy that emerged in the fifth century B.C.E. Also in the Timaeus, Plato mentions the “young gods” whose job it is to steer souls. The identity of these gods would become a problem in later Platonism, but they are established, at least by the first century as planetary god (Philo, De opificio mundi, 46-47). As this dialogue was treated with great importance in Platonism during the formative period of Hellenistic astrology, this passage could have been used by those looking for philosophical justification for the practice. Plato further expresses in the Laws(7.821a-822c; 10.986e) the value of studying astronomy for the sake of astral piety. He points out that the name planetos (from “to wander”) is a misnomer, for the Sun, Moon and planets display a cyclical regularity in their course that can be more accurately understood by astronomical research. We can suspect, in this regard, the influence of contemporary astronomers and students in the academy such as Eudoxus. Astral piety, however, is to be contrasted with “astrology” proper that originated with the attempt to apply reason, order, and predictability to phenomena that had been previously considered to be merely astral omens.
Plato held in low regard the divinatory arts that are not prophetic, i.e., a madness (manic/mantic) directly inspired by the gods (cf. Ion). He expressed an attitude of ambiguity toward divination revealed in the double-edged characterization of Theuth (cf. Phaedo, 274a), the inventor of number, calculation, geometry, astronomy, games and writing. Just as writing results in a soul’s forgetfulness through the mediation of symbols, semiotic or sign-based prediction, as astrology was often considered, is inferior to directly inspired prophecy (Phaedo, 244c).
As early as Hesiod, the Greeks mythologized ages of civilization. The Golden Age, in which the gods walked upon the earth, gave way to Silver, then Bronze, then Iron Age. Empedocles taught of a natural cycle of the interplay of Love and Strife: Love and harmony dominated one Age, then Strife in the next Age. Plato also expresses world ages, particularly in the Statesman or Politicus (269d-274d). Throughout the myths in this dialogue and others, he introduced the notion of a “cosmos” or a rational order and ontological hierarchy of the spheres of heavenly beings, elements, daimons, and earthly inhabitants. The cosmologies in Plato’s dialogues marked the emergence of a rational cosmic order in place of earlier cosmogonies. His Timaeus dialogue, with its detailed story of the creation of the world, was to become, perhaps the most influential book along with the Septuagint in the late Hellenistic era). Babylonian astronomical cycles would, soon after Plato, fuse with Greek cosmologies. In the Myth of Er in the Republic, Plato describes the cosmos as held together by the Spindle of Necessity, such that the spheres of the fixed stars and the planets are held together by an axis of a spindle. Sirens sing to move the spheres (or whorls) while the Three Moirai participate in turning the wheel. Each whorl has its own speed, with the sphere of the fixed stars moving the fastest and in the direction opposite those of the planets. In the Phaedrus (245c-248c) dialogue, he further illustrates the Law of Destiny that governs souls who accompany the procession of the gods in a heavenly circuit for a period of 1000 years. If the souls remember the Good (those of the philosophers) they will regain lost wings of immortality in three circuits or 3000 years. Otherwise they fall to the earth and continue a cycle of rebirths for 10,000 years. Immortal souls dwell in the rim of the heavens among the stars.
This leads to another significant development introduced by Plato, one that would become critical for the Hellenistic spread of astrology and astral piety – the ensouled nature of celestial bodies. Plato gives the planets and stars a divine ontological status absent in the writings of the pre-Socratics, many of whom took the planets and stars to be material bodies of one substance or another. (for example, Anaxagoras [Plato,Apology, 26d]; Xenophanes [Aetius, De placitis reliquiae, 347.1]; Anaximander [Aristotle De caelo, 295b10]; Leucippus and Democritus [Diogenes Laertius, Lives, 9.30-32]). In the Laws (10.893b-899d; 12.966e-967d), Plato posits that Soul is older than created things and an immanent governor of the world of changing matter. Secondly, the motion of the stars and other heavenly bodies are under the systematic governance of Nous. That the circuits of the planets and stars have an ordered regularity or rationality, and that they are always in motion, indicates that they are immortal and ensouled (cf. Phaedrus, 245c). While leaving open the question of whether the Sun, Moon and planets create their own physical bodies or inhabit them as vehicles, Plato includes in the Athenian’s argument that celestial beings are in fact gods, and (unlike the thought of the Atomists) are engaged in the affairs of human beings (Laws, 10.899a-d). Pre-Socratic philosophers such as Anaxagoras who believed that mind (Nous) governs the cosmos, failed in their cosmological account by not also recognizing the priority of soul over body (Laws, 12.967b-d). The conception of mind moving soulless bodies, noted the Athenian, led to common accusations that studying astronomy promotes impiety.
As Babylonian astronomical cycles met with a rational and ensouled Greek cosmos, the basis for both Stoic eternal recurrence and technical Hellenistic astrology was formed.
The Platonic dialogue Epinomis, most likely written by Phillip of Opus, demonstrates a transformation of the view of the heaven that soon paved the “western way” for astrology. This dialogue shows the transformation of the planets into visible representations of the Olympian gods, just as the Babylonian planets were images of their pantheon. The older names of the planets encountered in Homer and Hesiod (and in Plato’s Republic) designated their appearance rather than divine personification. Jupiter was shining (Phaithon), Mercury was twinkling (Stilbôn), Mars was fiery (Pureos) and Venus was the bright morning star and evening star (Phosphoros and Vesperos). In the Epinomis, the planets are given proper names for Greek gods, though the author leaves open the question of whether the celestial beings are the gods themselves or likenesses fashioned by the gods (theous autous tauta humnêteon orthotata, ê gar theous eikonas hôs agalmata hupolabein gegonenai, theôn autôn ergasamenon, 983e). The new names of planets as Greek gods corresponded loosely with the astral deities of Babylonian astrology, such as the identification of ruling Olympian, Zeus, with the planet Jupiter, replacing the principle Babylonian god Marduk. Ištar (female as evening star, male as morning star) became Aphroditê/Venus, Nergal (god of destruction) Ares/Mars, Nabu Hermes/Mercury, Ninib Kronos/Saturn, and Sin became the female lunar deity Selênê.
The author of Epinomis extends the sentiment of astral piety evident in the Laws, and goes so far as to say that the highest virtue is piety, and that astronomy is the art/science that leads to this virtue (989b-990a) – for it teaches the orderliness of the celestial gods, harmony, and number. While Plato himself would never place the heavenly gods in direct control of a person’s destiny, the distinction between the fatalism of such a control measured by astrology and an astral piety that permitted some intervention of gods in human affairs was not sharply drawn. Does the care of the gods for “all things great and small” (epimeloumenoi pantôn, smikrôn kai meizonôn, 980d) mean that it is through their activities or motions they control, guide or occasionally intervene in human matters? While we do not yet see a clear distinction between astral piety and practical astrology, later texts on mystery cults, Gnosticism, Hermeticism, and magic demonstrate that someone who either worships stars, or is concerned with their ontological status, need not be technically proficient in astronomy. Nor must they believe that life is fated by astrally determined necessity. Likewise, the technical Hellenistic astrologers who calculated birth charts and made predictions did not necessarily practice rituals in reverence to planetary gods. While there is no clear evidence for a unified school in which technical astrologers were indoctrinated into both technique and theory of the craft, the fact that the Hellenistic techniques (barring the basic foundation of Babylonian astrology) had developed in a variety of conflicting ways speaks to the possibility of several schools of thought in theory, practice, and perhaps geographic distance. As each astrologer contributed their own techniques or variations on techniques, the technical material quickly multiplied, and students of astrology had many authoritative writers to follow. The most likely scenario is that the practicing astrologers possessed a variety of viewpoints about the life and “influence” of the planets and stars, based on available cosmological views in religion and philosophy. While borrowing freely from Stoic, Pythagorean and Platonic thought, the astrologers who would soon emerge varied theoretically on issues such as which aspects of earthly existence may or may not be subject to Fate and the influence of the stars, and whether or not the soul is affected by celestial motions and relationships.
Although the founder of Stoicism, Zeno of Citium, integrated fate into the system of physics, the first Stoic to write a treatise On Fate (Peri heimarmenês) is Chrysippus of Soli (280-207 B.C.E.). Xenocrates and Epicurus both penned lost works of the same title prior to his (Diog. Laert., 4.12; 10.28). Given the influence of Xenocrates on the Stoa on matters as important as oikeôisis, there is no reason to think that all of the issues of fate and freedom discussed by Chrysippus originate with him. Later Stoics such as Boethus, Posidonius and Philopator, dedicated works to fate, a topic that would become a critical issue for all Hellenistic schools of thought. The development of Hellenistic astrology is placed in the context of these theories.
Stoic theory of fate involves the law of cause and effect, but unlike Epicurean atomism, it is not a purely mechanistic determinism because at the helm is divine reason. Logos, for the Stoics, was the causal principle of fate or destiny. This principle is not simply external to human beings, for it is disseminated through the cosmos as logos spermatikos (seminal reason) which is particularly concentrated in humans who are subordinate partners of the gods. Individual logoi are related to the cosmic logos through living in harmony with nature and the universe. This provided the basis of Stoic ethics, for which there is the goal of eupoia biou or smooth living rather than fighting with the natural and fated order of things. Chrysippus makes a distinction between fate (heimarmenê) and necessity (anankê) in which the former is a totality of antecedent causes to an event, while the latter is the internal nature of a thing, or internal causes. By its nature, a pot made of clay can be shattered, but the actual events of the shattering of a specific pot are due to the sum total of external causes and inner constraints. Fate, in general, encompasses the internal causes, though to be fated does not exclude the autonomy of individuals because particular actions are based on internal considerations such as will and character. Some events are considered to be co-fated by both external circumstances and conscious acts of choice. Diogenianus gives examples of co-fatedness, e.g., the preservation of a coat is co-fated with the owner’s care for it, and the act of having children is co-fated with a willingness to have intercourse (Stoicorum veterum fragmenta, 2.998). Character or disposition also plays a part in determining virtue and vice. Polemical writers such as Alexander of Aphrodisias characterize the Stoic position as maintaining that virtue and vice are innate. However, it is more accurate to say that for the Stoics an individual is born morally neutral, though with a natural inclination towards virtue (virtue associated with reason/logos) that can be enhanced through training or corrupted through neglect. Though morally neutral at birth, a human being is not a tabula rasa, but has potentialities which make him more or less receptive to good and bad influences from the environment. An individual cannot act contrary to his or her character, which is a combination of innate and external factors, but there is the possibility of acquiring a different character, as a sudden conversion. Since character determines action the ethical responsibility rests with the most immediate causes. An often cited example is that of a cylinder placed on a hill – the initial and external cause of being pushed down the hill represents the rational order of fate, while its naturally rollable shape represents will and character of the mind (Aulus Gellius, Noctes Atticae, 7.2.11). Cultivation of character through knowledge and training was thought to result in “harmonious acceptance of events” (which are governed by the rational plan of the cosmos), whereas lack of culture results in the errors of pitting oneself against fate (Gellius, 7.2.6).
Berossus, a Babylonian priest who settled on the island of Cos and the author of Babuloniakos, is often credited for bringing Babylonian astrology to the Greek-speaking world. Because he is thought to have flourished around 280 B.C.E., he is not the first to expose Greek speakers to this art, but he is known for founding an astronomical and astrological school. Kidinnu and Soudines, two Babylonian astronomers mentioned by second century C.E. Vettius Valens, also contributed to Hellenistic astronomy and astrology. Although many of the technical and theoretical details of pre-Hellenistic Babylonian astrology in Greece are lost in all but a few tablets, the doctrine of apokatastasis or eternal recurrence is attributed to Berossus by Seneca (Quaest. nat., 3.2.1). One scholar of the history of astronomy (P. Schnabel,Berossus und die babylonisch-hellenistische Literatur, Leipzig 1923) argued that Kidinnu possessed a theory of “precession of the equinox” prior to Hipparchus. Precession occurs due to a slight rotation of the earth’s axis resulting in a cyclical slippage of the vernal point in reference to the stars. (See section on Ptolemy for more on precession) From this was concluded an eternal recurrence based on the precession of the vernal point through the constellations. Schnabel’s theory, however, had been refuted by Neugebauer. Whatever the case may be, it is likely that Babylonian cosmological theories influenced the founding Stoics, particularly Chrysippus.
The early Stoic version of the eternal recurrence is that a great conflagration (ekpurôsis) marks a stage in the cycle of the reconstitution of the cosmos (apokatastasis). One cycle, a Great Year (SVF, 2.599), would last until the planets align in their original position or zodiac sign in the cosmos (SVF, 2.625). Each age would end in Fire, the purest of elements and the irreducible cosmic substance, and would be followed by a restoration of all things. This fire, for the Stoics, was a “craftsmanly fire” (pur tekhnikonidentified with Zeus and of a different nature than the material fire that was one of the four elements. In the reconstitution of the world, the fiery element would interact with air to create moisture, which then condenses into earth. The four elements would then organize in their proper measures to create living beings (SVF, 1.102). By Necessity, the principle cohesive power of the cosmos, the same souls which existed in one cycle would then be reconstituted in the cosmos and would play the same part in the same way, with perhaps an insignificant variation or two. This concept from the early Stoa is sometimes known as the “eternal recurrence.” Because human souls are rational seeds of God (Logos, Zeus, Creative Fire), the conflagration is an event in which all souls return to the pure substance of creative fire (pur technikon), Zeus. This is not to be understood as an “afterlife” of human souls, as one would find in Christianity, for example. God, then restored in his own completion, assesses the lives of the previous cycle and fashions the next great age of the world that will contain an identical sequence of events. Heraclitus, whom the Stoics claimed as a precursor, possessed an earlier doctrine of conflagration, though it is not to be assumed that his generation and decay of the cosmos was measured by the planetary circuits, for its movement, to him, is a pathway up and down rather than circular (Diog. Laert., 9. 6). As reported by Philo, the only Stoics to have rejected the eternal recurrence include Boethus of Sidon, Panaetius, and a mature Diogenes of Babylon (De aeternitate mundi, 76-7).
Astrological configurations were specified as part of the Stoic-Babylonian theory of eternal recurrence. According to Nemesius,
The Stoics say that when the planets return to the same celestial sign [sêmeion], in length and breadth [mêkos kai platos], where each was originally when the world was first formed, at the set periods of time they cause conflagration and destruction of existing things. Once again the world returns anew to the same condition as before; and when the stars are moving again in the same way, each thing that occurred in the previous period will come to pass indiscernibly. (SVF, 2.625, tr. Long and Sedley, Hellenistic Philosophers V. 1, p. 309).
The word sêmeion used by Nemesius could represent any celestial indicator, though the typical word for “sign of the zodiac” was zôidion. The celestial position of “length and breath” (latitude and longitude) is more specifically identified by second century C.E. astrologer Antiochus as the last degree of the zodiac sign of Cancer or the first degree of Leo. A variation of this theory of apokatastasis includes anantapokatastatis, which is an additional destruction by water which occurs when the planets align in the opposing sign, Capricorn. Such destruction by a Great Flood during this alignment was also attributed to Berossus by Seneca. Fourth century astrologer turned Christian, Firmicus Maternus, associatedapokatastasis with the Thema Mundi (or Genesis Cosmos), which is a “birth chart” for the world consisting of each planet in the 15th degree of its own sign. For the sake of consistency with the Stoic eternal cosmos, Firmicus claimed this chart does not indicate that the world had any original birth in the sense of creation, particularly one that could be conceived of by human reason or empirical observation. The Great Year contains all possible configurations and events. Because it exceeds the span of human records of observation, there is no way of determining the birth of the world. He claimed that the schema had been invented by the Hermetic astrologers to serve as an instructional tool often employed as allegory (Mathesis, 3.1). A more common Genesis Cosmos mentioned in astrological texts is a configuration of all planets in their own signs and degrees of exaltation hupsoma), special regions that had been established in Babylonian astrology.
The eternal recurrence doctrine in Stoicism entails justification of divination and belief in the predictability of events. The Sun, Moon and planets, as gods, possess the pur technikon and are not destroyed in theekpurôsis (SVF, 1.120). While their physical substance is destroyed, they maintain an existence as thoughts in the mind of Zeus. Because the gods are indestructible, they maintain memory of events that take place within a Great Year and know everything that will happen in the following cycles (SVF, 2.625). Divination, for Stoicism, is therefore possible, and even a divine gift. Stoics who accepted divination include Chrysippus, Diogenes of Babylon, and Antipater (SVF, 2.1192). The presupposition that divination is a legitimate science was also used by Chrysippus as an argument in favor of fate. Cicero, however, argued for the incompatibility of divination and Stoicism (De fato, 11-14), particularly the incompatibility between Chryssipus’ modal logical (which allows for non-necessary future truths) and the necessary future claimed by divination’s power of prediction. These non-necessary future truths include all things that happen “according to us” (eph’ hêmin). The example argument presented by Cicero, “If someone is born at the rising of the Dogstar, he will not die at sea,” would not, by his account, fall under the category of non-necessary truths since the antecedent truth is necessary (as a past true condition). Therefore the conclusion would also be necessary according to Chrysippus’ logic. Cicero mentions Chrysippus’ defense against charges of such contradictions, but regardless of the success or failure of Chysippus’ defense against them, the issue for the possibility of divination, for the Stoics, was not considered a logical contradiction between fate and free will. The eph hêmin in Stoicism was based on a disposition of character that, while not a causal necessity, would lead one to make decisions between the good, bad, and indifferent in accordance with nature. Because human beings are by nature the rational seeds (logoi spermatikoi) of the Godhead, their choices will correspond to the cosmic fate inherent in the eternal recurrence, and would not alter that which is divined. For Chrysippus, at least, the laws of divination are accepted as empirically factual (or proto-science) and not as a matter of logicalconnectivity between past, present, and future. Since divination occurs as a matter of revelation thoughsigns, the idea that there can be knowledge of a necessary causal antecedent leading to a future effect is not the principle behind it (cf. Bobzein, p. 161-170). The Stoic argument for divination through signs would be as follows: if there are gods, they must both be aware of future events and must love human beings while holding only good intentions toward them. Because of their care for human beings, signs are then given by the gods for potential knowledge of future events. These events are known by the gods, though not alterable by them. If signs are given, then the proper means to interpret them must also be given. If they are not interpreted correctly, the fault does not lie with the gods or with divination itself, but with an error of judgment on the part of the interpreter (Cicero, De divinatione, 1.82-3; 1.117-18).
Another theory in support of divination and by extension astral divination, is that of cosmic sympathy. Cosmic sympathy was already prevalent in Hipparchean medical theory, though Posidonius is credited for its development in the Stoic school. Posidonius, though, claimed to have drawn this notion from Democritus, Xenophanes, Pythagoras and Socrates. Stoic physical theory holds that all things in the universe are connected and held together in their interactions through tension. The active and passive principles move pneuma, the substance that penetrates and unifies all things. In fact, this tension holds bodies together, and every coherent thing would collapse without it. Pneuma as the commanding substance of the soul penetrates the cosmos. This cosmos, for the Stoics, is both a rational and sensate living being (Diog. Laert., 7.143). The Stoics thought that the cosmos is ensouled and has impulses or desires (hormai). Whereas in Platonism these impulses are conflicting and need the rational part of the soul to govern them, in Stoicism desires of the cosmic soul are harmoniously drawn toward a rational (though not entirely accessible to human beings) end, which is Logos, or Zeus’ return to himself through the cosmic cycle of apokatastasis. So the idea of cosmic sympathy supports divination, because knowledge of one part of the cosmos (such as a sign) is, by way of the cohesive substance of pneuma, access to the whole. In contrast to Plato’s disparaging view of divination that it is not divinely inspired but based on the artless fumbling of human error, the Stoic view, for the most part, is that rational means of divination can be developed. The push to develop a scientific (meaning systematic and empirical) knowledge-based divination finds its natural progression in mathematically based astrology.
Stoic-influenced astrologers went a step further than Stoic philosophers to define innate potentials of character by assigning them to the zodiac and planets. Virtuous and corrupt characteristics are identified as determined by the potential of the natal chart, while external circumstances are indicated by the combination of this chart with transits of planets through time and certain periods of life set in motion by the configurations in the natal chart. For instance, in his list of personality characteristics for individuals born with certain zodiac signs on the horizon, Teukros of Babylon (near Cairo) includes character traits that are not morally neutral. For example, those born when the first decan of Libra is ascending are “virtuous” (enaretous), while those born when the third decan of Scorpio is ascending “do many wrongs” or are “law-breakers” (pollous adikountas).
While it is clear that Stoic philosophy influenced the development of astrology, the attitude of the Stoa towards astrology, however, varied on the basis of the individual philosophers. Cicero stated that Diogenes of Babylon believed astrologers are capable of predicting disposition and praxis (one’s life activity), but not much else. Diogenes, though, is said to have calculated a “Great Year” in his earlier years (Aetius, De placitis reliquiae, 364.7-10). His turn to skepticism changed his view on Stoic ekpurosisand likely modified his view on astrology. Middle Stoic Panaetius is said to have rejected astrology altogether. That an astrological example is used by Cicero to illustrate a contradiction in Chrysippus’ logic and divination does not necessarily mean that Chrysippus himself had much exposure to or took an interest in astrology. (Cicero’s example is, “If someone is born at the rising of the Dogstar, he will not die at sea.” Si quis (verbi causa) oriente Canicula natus est, is in mari non morietur. De fato, 12). In Chrysippus’ time, Hellenistic astrology had not yet been formulated systematically. However, given that the example is based on a consideration of importance to Babylonian astrology, the rising of the fixed star Sirius, the possibility exists that Chrysippus or one of his contemporaries discussed astrology in the context of logic and divination.
Posidonius was alleged by Augustine to have been “much given to astrology” (multum astrologiae deditus) and “an assertor fatal influence of the stars” (De civitate dei 5.2). His actual relationship to astrology, however, is more complicated, but there are several reasons to think that he supported astrology. For one, in his belief that the world is a living animal, he followed Chrysippus in identifying the commanding faculty of the world soul as the heavens (Diog. Laert., 7.138-9. Cleanthes considered it to be the Sun). Secondly, Posidonius had a strong research interest in astronomy and meteorology. He was the first to systematically research the connection between ocean tides and the phases of the Moon. His research in this area possibly led him to his doctrine of cosmic sympathy, as he considered natural affinities among things of the earth. Cosmic sympathy allows for an association between signs (within nature that can extend to planets and stars) and future events without direct causality. If the higher faculty of the cosmos is located in the heavens, then it is more likely that these signs would carry weight for Posidonius. Thirdly, Cicero, who can be given more credibility than Augustine by having attended Posidonius’ lectures, mentions him in connection with astrology in De divinatione (1.130). Fourthly, Posidonius (as a Platonic-influenced thinker) believed idea that the signs of the zodiac (zôdia) are ensouled bodies – living beings (Fr. 149, Edelstein-Kidd / Fr. 400a, Theiler). However, given that Posidonius is flourishing at the same time as the earliest textual evidence for Hellenistic astrology (first century B.C.E.; some “technical” Hermetic fragments about Solar and Lunar observations may be earlier), it is difficult to say what type of astrology he would have had an interest in – whether it had been remnants of the Babylonian omen-based astrology, or the beginning formulation of a systematic Greco-Roman astrology. Because he was widely traveled, he may have gained exposure to one or more astrologers or schools of astrologers. With his observations of the connection between seasonal fluctuations of the tides and the Solar/Lunar cycles, he apparently refuted Seleucus, a Babylonian astronomer who believed that the tides also fluctuation according to the zodiac sign in which the Moon would fall; he claimed the tides were regular when the Moon would be in the equinoctial signs of Aries or Libra and irregular in the solstitial signs of Capricorn, Cancer (Fr. 218, Edelstein-Kidd / Fr. 26, Theiler). This observation would not have necessarily been considered an astrological one, though it is schematized according to characteristics of the zodiac rather than lunations and seasons, and such schematizations were quite common in Hellenistic astrology. It cannot be said with certainty whether Posidonius’ advocacy of cosmic sympathy lent support to the development of astrology or if this development itself reinforced Posidonius’ own theories of cosmic sympathy and fate.
The importance of astrology in politics of first century Rome was aided by its alignment with Stoic fatalism and cosmic sympathy. Balbillus, son of Thrasyllus and astrologer to Nero, Seneca, and a certain Alexandrian Stoic, Chaeremon, were all appointed tutors to L. Domitius. Chaeremon (who Cramer, p. 116, identifies with the Egyptian priest/astrology in Porphyry’s Letter to Anebo and in Eusebius’Praeparatio evang., 4.1) wrote a work on comets (peri komêtôn suggramma) that cast these typically foreboding signs in a favorable light. Seneca, too, wrote a work on comets (Book 7 of Quaestiones naturales), in which he portrays some as good omens for the Empire (cf. Cramer, p. 116-118).
So far in this account of the theoretical development of Hellenistic astrology, the pre-Socratic thinkers contributed a deep concern for fate and justice. Plato contributed an orderly and rational cosmos, while those in the early Academy displayed an astral piety that recognized the planets as gods or representations of gods. The Stoics contributed theories of fate and divination, that already had an astrological component with the Babylonian contribution to the Eternal Recurrence. Cosmic sympathy, present in Greek medicine and popularized by the middle Stoic Posidonius, provided astrologers with a theoretical grounding for the associations among planets, zodiac signs, and all other things. One notable Stoic contribution to Hellenistic astrology which distinguishes it from the Babylonian is the incorporation of Chryssipus’ principle of two forces, active and passive, manifest in the activities of the four elements. Fire and air were active, earth and water passive. The astrologers later assigned these elements and dynamic qualities to each sign of the zodiac. Further philosophical developments by the Middle Platonists and the Neopythagoreans would then lead to astrology as a system of knowledge due to its systematic and mathematical nature. The systematic nature would make it plausible to some and a worthy or dangerous foe to others. These developments set astrology apart, epistemologically speaking, from other manners of divination such as haruspicy (study of the liver of animals), or dream interpretation.
The union between Pythagorean theory and Platonism should come as no surprise given Plato’s late interest in Pythagoreanism. From the early academy onward, elements of Pythagorean theory became part and parcel of Platonism. Speusippus wrote a work on Pythagorean numbers (Fr. 4), and he would become influential in this regard, if not as directly on subsequent Academy members as on Neopythagorean circles. He and Xenocrates both offered cosmic hierarchies formed from the One and the Dyad. The One, or Monad, is a principle of order and unity, while the Dyad is the principle of change, motion, and division. The manner in which these principles are related was a critical issue inherited from the early Academy. Xenocrates (Fr. 15) believed that stars are fiery Olympian Gods and in the existence of sublunary daimons and elemental spirits. We see in Xenocrates both the identification of Gods with stars (as we saw in Phillip of Opus) and the notion that Gods are forces of Nature, thereby creating an important theoretical issue for astrology, namely what is the domain of influence of the planetary gods, as the Olympians are identified with the planets. He also believed that the world soul is formed from Monad and Dyad, and that it served as a boundary between the supralunary and sublunary places. Xenocrates’ cosmology would be highly influential on Plutarch, who elaborated on the roles of the world soul, the daimons, the planets and fixed stars.
The middle Platonists, many of whom believed themselves to be true expounders of Plato, were influenced by other schools of thought. The physical theories of Antiochus of Ascalon are very Stoic in nature. For example, he incorporated the Stoic “qualities” (poiotêtes), which were moving vibrations that act upon infinitely divisible matter, into his cosmology. The unity of things is held together by the world soul (much as it is held together in Stoic theory by pneuma). Antiochus equated the Stoic Logos/Zeus with the Platonic World Soul, and this soul of the cosmos governs both the heavenly bodies and things on earth that affect humankind. He also accepted the Stoic Pur Tekhnikon (Creative Fire) as the substance composing the stars, gods, and everything else. There is little to indicate that Antiochus held in his cosmology the notion common to some other Platonists of transcendent immateriality; his universe, like the Stoics, is material. On the subject of fate and free will, he argues against Chrysippus (if he is in fact the philosopher identified as doing so in Cicero’s De fato and Topica) by accepting the reality of free will rather than the illusion of free will created simply by the limitations of human knowledge in grasping fated future events. Antiochus’ view on other beings in the cosmos, particularly the ontological status of stars and planets, may be found in his Roman student Varro who stated that the heavens, populated by souls (the immortal occupying aether and air), are divided by elements in this order from top to bottom: aether, air, water, earth.
From the highest circle of heaven to the circle of the Moon are aetherial souls, the stars and planets, and these are not only known by our intelligence to exist, but are also visible to our eyes as heavenly gods.” (from Natural Theology, tr. Dillon, Middle Platonists, p. 90).
Daimons and heroes, then, were thought to occupy the aerial sphere. The importance of Antiochus for the development of Hellenistic astrology may be his break with the skepticism of the New Academy, one which allowed the Middle Platonists to espouse more theological and speculative views about the soul and the cosmos while anticipating Neoplatonic theories. In Alexandria, which, not by coincidence would become a hotbed for astrological theory and practice, Platonism incorporated strong Neopythagorean elements. Eudorus of Alexandria, who wrote a commentary on Plato’s Timaeus, contributed to the importance of Timaean cosmology in middle and Neoplatonic thought. References to Eudorus’ are found in Achilles’ work, Introduction to Aratus’ Phenemona. Achille used Eudorus as a source for this work that also contains references to Pythagorean theories of planetary harmonies. We know from Achilles that Eudorus followed the Platonic and Stoic belief that the stars are ensouled living beings (Isagoga, 13). This intellectual climate is likely the immediate context for the development of systematic astrology – with its complex classifications of the signs, planets, and their placements in a horoscope, and the numerological calculations used for predicting all sorts of events in one’s life.
The revival of Pythagoreanism by the mid-first century B.C.E. brought about the acceptance of pythagorica of “Timaeus of Locri” and Ocellus Lucanus as genuinely “early” Pre-Platonic Pythagorean texts, though both mostly like date around the second century B.C.E., or at latest, the first half of the first century B.C.E. The Neopythagorean texts just mentioned are significant for the development of Hellenistic astrology. They represent cosmological theories that likely were used as justification for astrology.
In On the Nature of the Universe (peri tês tou pantos phuseôs), Ocellus argues for a perfectly ordered harmonious universe that is immutable and unbegotten. By appealing to the empirical rationale that we cannot perceive the universe coming to be and passing away, but only its self-identity, he concludes the eternity of the whole, including its part. This whole though is divided into two worlds, the supralunary and the sublunary. The heavens down to the Moon comprise a world of unchanging harmony that governs the sublunary realm of all changing and corruptible activity. In Platonic manner, the unchanging (the Monad) governs and generates the changing (the Dyad). In Pythagorean manner, the divine beings in the unchanging realm are in perfect harmony with one another through their regular motions. Visible signs for the unchanging harmony and self-subsistence of the universe are found in the harmonious movements of things in relation to one another. Based on the nature of the relations listed – “order, symmetry, figurations (skhêmatismoi), positions (theseis), intervals (diastaseis), powers, swiftness and slowness with respect to others, their numbers and temporal periods” (1.6) – he clearly means the movements of planets and stars. This list comprises the primary factors by which astrologers would assess the strength and qualities of planets in a given horoscope as the basis for the formulation of predictive techniques and statements. For instance, swiftness of planets was thought to make them stronger while slowness (which occurs close to the retrogradation motion) weakens the planet, while “figurations” (skhêmatismoi) is a word used for aspects, or the geometrical figures planets make to one another and the ascending sign (horoskopos). Temporal periods were assigned by astrologers in a variety of ways, though usually based on the “lesser years” of the planets, the time it took for one planet to complete its revolution with respect to a starting point in the zodiac. “Intervals” (diastaseis) were measures that were calculated either between planets or between planets and the horizon or culminating points in a horoscope; in the case of the latter, the intervals were used in astrology to determine strong and weak areas in the horoscope. The former notion of intervals was used for determining various time periods of one’s life assigned to each planet (cf. Valens, Anthologiarum, 3.3). “Numbers” was a term used to indicate a planet’s motion (as appearing from earth) as direct or retrograde. “Powers” (dunameis) of the planets are combinations of heating, cooling, drying, moistening – these powers made planets benevolent or malevolent (cf. Ptolemy, Tetrabiblos, 1.4). Ocellus goes on to name these powers as hot, cold, wet, and dry, and he contrasts them with the “substances” (ousiai) or elements of fire, earth, water and air. The powers and substances, or “qualities” and “elements” as they are more commonly called, were used in horoscopic astrology to describe the natures of the planets and zodiac signs. In Ocellus’ explanation of astral causality, the powers are immortal forms that affect changes on the sublunary substances (2.4-5).
Whether or not Ocellus and other Neopythagoreans are at the forefront of formulating these particular astrological rules, he provides a metaphysical basis for the notion that the planets and stars effect changes on earth. He is further described as saying that the Moon is the locus where immortality (above) and mortality (below) meet. He also says the obliquity of the zodiac, the pathway of the Sun, is the inclining place at which the supralunary generates activity in the sublunary realm. The Sun’s seasonal motion conforms to the powers (hot, cold, wet, and dry) that bring about changes in the substances (elements); the ecliptic path inclines these powers into the realm of strife and nature.
In his discussion on the generation of men, Ocellus argues, in more of an Aristotelian than Platonic sense (as found in On Generation and Corruption, that the only participation of men in immortality is through the gift by divinities of the power of reproduction. Following rules of morality in connubial relations results in living in harmony with the universe. Immoral transgressions, though, are punished by the production of ignoble offspring. A manner of cosmic sympathy (as found in Greek medicine) plays a role in determining that the circumstances of conception (such as a tranquil state of mind) will reflect upon the nature of the offspring. This notion is in keeping with the fact that astrologers studied charts not only for the moment of birth, but for conception as well. The only major difference is that for the astrologers, the circumstances of the birth appear to be reflected universally at a given time and not the direct result of moral or immoral actions as it is for Ocellus. The moment of birth or conception for the astrologers is reflected in all things of nature and in any activities initiated at that particular moment, as reflected in the positions of the planets and signs. The technical astrologers typically did not include reflections on moral retributions in their manuals of astral fate. They were primarily concerned with detailing knowledge of fate for its own sake, though speculation about such matters as retribution and rebirth is not excluded by astrological theory.
The Hellenistic text attributed to Timaeus Locrus, On the Nature of the World and the Soul, purports to be the original upon which Plato drew for his dialogue of his name. For the most part, it consists of a summary of the material by Plato. The circles of the Same and the Different carry the fixed stars and the planets respectively. The sphere of the fixed stars containing the cosmos is granted the Pythagorean perfect figure of the dodecahedron. One addition of note for the theory of astrology is the doctrine of the creation of souls. The four elements are made by the demiurge in equal measure and power, and Soul of man is made in the same proportion and power. Individual souls of human beings are fashioned by Nature (who has been handed the task by the demiurge of creating mortal beings) from the Sun, Moon, and planets, from the circle of Difference with a measure of the circle of the Same that she (Nature being hypostasized as the female principle) mixes in the rational part of the soul. There appears in this to be a difference in individual souls reflecting different fates based on the composition. While this merely reiterates what is found in Plato’s Timaeus (42d-e), the supposition that one could read this account straight from Timaeus Locrus gave authority to these notions. It is likely that these ideas filtered to the astrologers, who would devise methods for seeking out the ruling planet (oikodespotês) for an individual (see section on Porphyry). Perhaps what they were seeking in the horoscope was one of the “young gods” whose task it was to fashion the mortal body of each soul and to steer their course away from evils. As mentioned above, some philosophers associated the young gods with the planets.
Astrological fragments of a writer “Timaeus Praxidas” date to the same period (early to middle first century B.C.E.), but there is little textual evidence to indicate that these are one and the same writer. What it at least indicates is that the legend of Timaeus lent authority to the astrological writers.
Thrasyllus (d. 36 C.E.), a native of Alexandria, was not only the court astrologer to Tiberius, but a grammarian and self-professed Pythagorean who studied in Rhodes. Given that he published an edition of Plato’s works (and is known for the arrangement of the dialogues into tetralogies), and that he wrote a work on Platonic and Pythagorean philosophy, we can assume that his astrological theory represents Middle Platonism of the early first century C.E. However, a summary of his astrological work “Pinax” (tables), indicates that he is drawing upon earlier sources, particularly the pseudepigrapha of “Nechepso and Petosiris” and Hermes Trismegistus. A numerological table, perhaps containing zodiac associations to numbers as that found in Teukros of Babylon, is also attributed to Thrasyllus. It appears that his own philosophy contains a mixture of Hermetic and Pythagorean elements.
A search for exact origins of astrology’s development into a complex system remains inconclusive, but the following can be surmised. The combination of Pythagorean theory, such as the supralunary realm influencing the sublunar, Platonic ensouled planets moving on the circle of the Different, Stoic determinism and cosmic sympathy, and the emergence of a Hermetic tradition, comprised the intellectual context for the systematic structuring of astrology, its classifications of the signs, planets, and their placements in a horoscope, and the numerological calculations used for predicting all sorts of events in one’s life.
Besides being a prolific writer on a variety of subjects, Plutarch was, philosophically speaking, a Platonist, as defined by his era, that is, one influenced by Aristotelian, Stoic, and Neopythagorean notions. In Plutarch’s case this includes ideas culled from his study of Persian and Egyptian traditions. By his time (late first century C.E.), astrology had been systematized and appropriated by Greek language and thinking, and in Rome, the political implications of astrological theory were made evident in the relationships between astrologers and emperors (such as Thrasyllus and his son Balbillus) and in the edicts against predictions about emperors (cf. Cramer, 99 ff). Plutarch’s own form of Platonism did not then directly contribute to the technical development of astrology, but it does add a Middle Platonic contribution to an explanation of how astrology gained some credibility and much popularity in the first three centuries of the common era. He also borrowed some astrological concepts (and metaphors) for his own philosophy. First of all, as a priest of Apollo, Plutarch saw all other deities as symbolic aspects of One God that is invisible and unintelligible. He gained impetus for this from an etymology of “Apollo,” which is explained as an alpha-privative a-pollos, or “not many” (De E apud Delphos, 393b). He resists a pure identification of the Sun with Apollo (De pythiae oraculis 400c-d), because the One God is Invisible, and the Sun an intelligible copy. He likens the Sun to one aspect, that of the Nous, the heart of the cosmos. The Moon is then associated with the cosmic Soul (and spleen), and the earth with the bowels. Taking cue from Plato’s suggestion in the Laws (10.896 ff) of two world souls, beneficent and malevolent (a concept Numenius would take up later), he believed the malevolent soul to be responsible for irrational motion in the sublunary world. The malevolent or irrational soul preexisted the demiurge’s creation. It is not pure evil, but the cause of evil operating in the sublunary realm, mixing with the good to create cosmic tension. Plutarch maintains the distinction of Ocellus between the generating supralunary realm and the generated sublunary realm, but he offers more detail about operations in the sublunary world of change. He posits two opposing principles or powers of good and evil that offer a right-handed straight path and a reversed, backwards path for souls (De Isis., 369e). Individual souls are microcosms of a world soul (based on Timaeus, 30b), and the parts of the soul reflect this cosmic tension. Souls are subject in the sublunary realm to a mixture of fate (heimarmenê), chance (tukhê), and free choice (eph’ hêmin). The “young gods”, the planetary gods in the Timaeus (42d-e) that steer souls, Plutarch designates as the province of the irrational soul. With the emphasis of the irrational soul and the mixture of forces in the sublunary realm, Plutarch’s cosmology allows for the possibility of astrology. Plutarch also posits four principles (arkhê) in the cosmos, Life, Motion, Generation and Decay (De genio Socratis, 591b). Life is linked to Motion through the activity of the Invisible, through the Monad; Motion is linked to Generation through the Mind (Nous); and Generation is linked to Decay through the Soul. The three Fates (Moirai) are also linked to this cycle as Clotho seated in the Sun presided over the first process, Atropo, seated in the Moon, over the second, and Lachesis over the third on Earth (cf. De facie in orbe lunae, 945c-d). At death the soul of a person leaves the body and goes to Moon, the mind leaves the soul and goes to Sun. The reverse process happens at birth. Plutarch is not rigid with his use of planetary symbolism, for in another place, he associates the Sun with the demiurge, and the young gods with the Moon, emphasizing the rational and irrational souls (De E apud Delphos, 393a).
Plutarch’s own opinion about astrology as a practice of prediction is ambiguous at best. He supported the probability of divination by human beings, although dimmed by the interference of the body, as evident in his arguments for it in On the E at Delphi (387) and in De defectu oraculorum (431e ff). However, he complains about generals who rely more heavily on divination than on counselors experienced in military affairs (Marius, 42.8). In his accounts of astrologers, his attitude appears to be more skeptical. InRomulus (12), he discusses the claims made by an astrologer named Taroutios, namely, of discovering the exact birth date and hour of Romulus as well as the time in which he lay the first stone of his city, by working backwards from his character to his birth chart. Plutarch considered astrologers’ claims that cities are subject to fate accessible by a chart cast for the beginning of their foundation to be extravagant. He also wrote about how Sulla, having consulted Chaldaeans, was able to foretell his own death in his memoirs (Sulla, 37.1). However, Plutarch finds himself at a loss at explaining why Marius would be successful in his reliance on divination while Octavius was not so fortunate accepting the forecasts of Chaldaeans.
Cicero’s account in On Divination of Eudoxus’ rejection of Chaldaean astrological predictions points to Greek awareness of Babylonian astrology as early as the third century B.C.E. Another account about Theophrastus’ awareness of Chaldaean horoscopic astrology (predicting for individuals rather than weather and general events) is given to us by Proclus (In Platonis Timaeum commentaria, 3.151). Technical manuals by Greek-speaking astrologers used for casting and interpreting horoscopic (natal) charts date as early as the late second century B.C.E. In addition to natal astrology, many of the fragments exemplify the practice of katarchical astrology, or the selection of the most auspicious moment for a given activity. Katarkhê was also used to ascertain events that had already happened, to view the course of an illness, or track down thieves, lost objects, and runaway slaves. Fragments attributed to Thrasyllus, the philosopher-astrology include such methods. This use of astrology implies that the astrologers themselves did not prescribe to strict fatalism, at least the kind that dictates that knowledge from signs of the heavens cannot influence events. Perhaps like Plutarch, they believed in a combination of fate, chance, and free will. Given the pervasiveness of cosmic sympathy and a unified cosmic order, astrology pertaining to proper moments of time and to natural occurrences was less controversial than that pertaining to the soul of human beings. However, the texts of the next few centuries focus primarily on natal rather than katarchic astrology. Methods to ascertain controversial matters such as one’s length of life would proliferate and play a significant part in Roman politics (cf. Cramer, p. 58 ff). Such fascination with either the fate or predisposition of individuals reflects a stronger concern in the late Hellenistic world for the life of the individual in a period of rapid political and social change.
The earliest Hermetic writings, the technical Hermetica (dated second century B.C.E. and contrasted with philosophical Hermetica cf. Fowden, p. 58) include works on astrology. As mentioned by Clement, (Stromata, 6.4.35-7), they include: on the ordering of the fixed stars, on the Sun, Moon and five planets, on the conjunctions and phases of the Sun and Moon, and on the times when the stars rise. These topics in the early Hermetica do not reflect much technical sophistication in comparison to the complicated techniques of prediction that we find in the katarchic and natal astrology texts of other astrological writers. The astronomical measurements that appear to be used for these topics are most likely for the purpose of katarchic astrology and ritual because they do not contain the apparatus for casting natal charts. An exception to the technical sparsity of astrology considered to be in the lineage of Hermes Trismegistus are the works attributed to Nechepso and Petosiris (typically dated around 150 B.C.E.), portions of which survive in quotations. Combined, they are considered a major source for many later astrologers, and are said by Firmicus Maternus to be in line with the Hermetic tradition, handed down by way of other Hermetic figures such as Aesclepius and Anubio, from Hermes himself. It is impossible to say to what extent the writers of these texts had organized existing techniques or invented new ones, but based on the frequency with which Nechepso and Petosiris are quoted by later authors, we can be certain that they were important conveyers of technical Hellenistic astrology. More about the astral theories in the later philosophical Hermeticism and Gnosticism will be discussed below.
Additional fragments are preserved of real and pseudepigraphical astrologers of the first centuries B.C.E and C.E. including Critodemus, Dorotheus of Sidon, Teukros of Babylon, (pseudo-)Eudoxus, Serapion, Orpheus, Timaeus Praxidas, Anubion, (pseudo-)Erasistratus, Thrasyllus, and Manilius. Only a few representative writers will be highlighted below.
For most of the early astrological writers, we can only speculate about their theoretical justification for the practice, two exceptions being first century B.C.E. Roman Stoic Manilius, (from whom we have the Latin didactic poem, Astronomica), and Thrasyllus, whose work is described above. Manilius was also associated with the Roman imperial circle, dedicating his work to either Augustus or Tiberius (see Cramer, p. 96, for more on this controversy). While his poetic account of astrology contains much technical material, there is little evidence to show that he himself practiced astrological prediction. Some scholars speculated that he intended to avoid the political dangers of the practice in his day with the poetic writing style and the exclusion of astrological doctrine about the planets, which is necessary for the practice (or his work could simply be incomplete). His Stoic philosophy is one in which Fate is immutable, and astrology is a means of understanding the cosmic and natural order of all things, but not of changing events. However fated we are, he says, is no excuse for bad behavior such as crime, for crime is still wicked and punishable no matter what its origin in the sequence of causal determinism (4.110-117). He used the regularity of the rising of the fixed stars and the courses of the Sun and Moon as proof against the Epicureans that nothing is left to chance and that the universe is commanded by a divine will (1.483-531). Nature apportions to the stars the responsibility over the destinies of individuals (3.47-58). Nature is not thought to be separate from reason, but is the agent of Fate – one orchestrated by a material god for reasons not readily accessible to the mortals who experience apparent injustices and turns of events that defy normal expectations (4.69-86). The purpose of the deity is simply to maintain order and harmony in its cosmos (1.250-254). Astrology demonstrates cosmic sympathy among all things and can be used to predict events insofar as it grants access to the predestined order. In addition to the use of astrology for psychological acceptance of one’s fate, Manilius emphasizes the aesthetic and religious benefits of its study, for he considers it a gift to mortals from the god Hermes for the sake of inducing reverence and piety of the cosmic deity.
Astrology had increased in popularity in the second century C.E., and two writers of this period operating under different philosophical influences, Ptolemy (c. 100-170 C.E.) and Vettius Valens (fl. 152-162 C.E.), will next be discussed. Ptolemy is an exception among the astrological authors because first and foremost he is an empirical scientist, and one who, like his philosophical and scientific contemporaries, is concerned with theories of knowledge. His works include those on astronomy, epistemology, music, geography, optics, and astrology. He is best known as an astronomer for his work Syntaxis mathematica (Almagest), but from the middle ages to present day, his astrological work,Apotelesmatica (or Tetrabiblos as it is more commonly known), has been considered the key representative of Greek astrology, primarily due to its prominence in textual transmission.
Scholars have claimed Ptolemy’s main philosophical influences to be either Peripatetic, Middle Stoic (Posidonius), Middle Platonist (Albinus) or Skeptic (sharing a possible connection with Sextus Empiricus). Any attempts to tie him to a single school would be futile. His eclecticism, though, is by no means an arbitrary amalgam of different schools, but a search for agreements (rather than disagreements sought by the Pyrrhonian Skeptics) and a scientist’s harmony of rationalism and empiricism (cf. Long in Dillon & Long, p. 206-207). His epistemological criteria (in On the Criterion shows only superficial differences with the Skeptics, while he often employs Stoic terminology (such as katalêpsis) without the Stoic technical meanings. He extends the Stoic notion of oikeiôsis (as the manner of familiarity that a Stoic Sage achieves with the cosmos) to the relations of familiarity that planets and zodiac signs share among themselves.
Because Ptolemy deviates significantly from other astrologers in theory and technique, some have doubted that he was a practicing astrologer at all. It is difficult to support this claim when in theTetrabiblos he makes a long argument in favor of astrology and he claims to have better methods than offered by the tradition. It seems best to call him a “revisionist” rather than a “non-astrologer.” His revisions and causal language make his position vulnerable to later attacks by Plotinus and other philosophers. The methods Ptolemy rejects include material that can be traced to the Hermetic Nechepso/Petosiris text, particularly the use of Lots (klêroi) and the division of the chart into twelve places (topoi) responsible for topics in life such as siblings, illness, travel, etc. Lots were points in the chart typically calculated from the positions of two planets and the degree of the ascending sign. He also rejects various subdivisions of the zodiac and nearly all numerologically based methods. He considered these methods to be disreputable and arbitrary because they are removed from the actual observations of planets and stars. (It might be noted here that he also rejects Pythagorean musicology on empirical grounds in his work Harmonica).
Ptolemy says, in the beginning of Book I, that the study of the relations of the planets and stars to one another (astronomy) can be used for the less perfect art of prediction based on the changes of the things they “surround” (tôn emperiekhomenon). He notes that the difficulty of the art of astrological prediction has made critics believe it to be useless, and he argues in favor of its helpfulness and usefulness. He blames bad and false practitioners for the failing of astrology. The rest of the argument involves the natural cosmic sympathy popularized by Posidonius. The influence of the Sun, Moon, and stars on natural phenomena, weather and seasons brings the possibility than men can likewise be affected in temperament due to this natural ambience (ton periekhon). The surrounding conditions of the time and place of birth contribute a factor to character and temperament (as we find earlier in Ocellus). While the supralunary movements are perfect and destined, the sublunary are imperfect, changeable, and subject to additional causes. Natural events such as weather and seasons are less complicated by additional causes than events in the lives of human beings. Rearing, custom, and culture are additional accidental causes that contribute to the destiny of an individual. He seems to encourage critics to allow astrologers to start their predictions with knowledge of these factors rather than do what is called a “cold reading” in modern astrology. The criticism he counters is that of Skeptics such as Sextus Empiricus, who elaborated on earlier arguments from the New Academy, and who argue that an astrologer does not know if they are making predictions for a human or a pack-ass (Adversus mathematicos, 5.94).
Ptolemy’s arguments that astrology is useful and beneficial are the following: 1) One gains knowledge of things human and divine. This is knowledge for its own sake rather than for the purpose of gains such as wealth or fame. 2) Foreknowledge calms the soul. This is a basic argument from Stoic ethics. 3) One can see through this study that there are other causes than divine necessity. Bodies in the heavens are destined and regular, but on earth are changeable in spite of receiving “first causes” from above. This corresponds again to the Neopythagorean Platonism found in Ocellus. These first causes can override secondary causes and can subsume the fate of an individual in the cases of natural disasters. Ptolemy’s attribution of the nature of planets and stars, which is the basis of their benefic or malefic nature, is that, like Ocellus before him, of heating, drying, moistening, and cooling. The stars in each sign have these qualities too based on their familiarity (oikeiôsis) with the planets. Geometrical aspects between signs, which are the basis of planetary relations, are also based on “familiarity” determined by music theory and the masculine or feminine assignment to the signs. He considers the sextile and trine aspects to be harmonious, and the quadrangle and opposition to be disharmonious.
Book 2 of Tetrabiblos includes material on astrological significations for weather, ethnology and astro-chorography. Ptolemy is not the first to delineate an astrological chorography (geographical regions assigned to signs of the zodiac), and his assignments differ significantly from those found in Dorotheus, Teukros, Manilius, and Paulus Alexandrinus. Book 3 and 4 consist of methods of prediction of various topics in natal astrology. Absent in his work is the katarchical astrology found in earlier writers. Ptolemy is the first astrologer to employ Hipparchus’ zodiac modified to account for the “precession of the equinox,” that is, the changing seasonal reference point against the background of the stars. This zodiac uses the vernal equinox as the beginning point rather than the beginning of one of the twelve constellations. (This “tropical” zodiac would become the standard in the Western practice of astrology up to present day. Modern opponents of astrology typically utilize precession – pointing out the fact that zodiac “signs” no longer match with the star constellations.) Other astrologers, including those shortly following Ptolemy, were either not aware of Hipparchus’ observation or did not find it important to make this adjustment. Valens claims to use another method of Hipparchus, but it is debatable whether or not he adjusted his zodiac to the vernal point. Ptolemy had no impact on other astrologers of the second century, likely because his texts were not yet in circulation.
We do not find in Ptolemy’s work the language of signs and astral divination, but a causal language – the relationships between the planets cause natural activity on earth, from weather to seasons to human temperament. However, Ptolemy argues for the fallibility of prediction, and cannot be considered a strict astral determinist for this reason, though he believed that astrology as a tool of knowledge could be made more accurate with improved techniques, closing the gap of fallibility. The idea that stars are causes is not original with Ptolemy, being an acceptable idea to Peripatetic thinkers cued by Aristotle’s eternal circular motions of the heavens as the cause of perpetual generation (On Generation and Corruption (336b15 ff). For Ptolemy, though, this idea as a justification for the practice of astrology was probably filtered through the Peripatetic influenced Neopythagoreans such as Ocellus. Ptolemy’s arguments may have been the target of subsequent attacks by Alexander of Aphrodisias, Plotinus and early Church Fathers.
The work Anthologiarum of Vettius Valens the Antiochian (written between 152-162 C.E.) is important for a number of reasons. It contains fragments of earlier writers such as Nechepso and Critodemus, and numerous horoscopes important for the study of the history of astronomy. He is also an astrological writer who best exemplifies the details of the practice and the mind of the practitioner. Having traveled widely in search of teachers, he exhibits techniques unavailable in other astrological texts, indicating much regional variety. Among his sources, he mentions the following astrologers and astronomers (in alphabetical order): Abram, Apollinarius, Aristarchus, Asclation, Asclepius, Critodemus, Euctemon, Hermeias, Hermes, Hermippus, Hipparchus, Hypsicles, Kidenas, Meton, Nechepso, Petosiris, Phillip, Orion, Seuthes and Soudines, Thrasyllus, Timaeus, Zoroaster. Valens claimed to have tested the methods and to have the advantage of making judgments about the methods through much toil and experience (cf. 6.9). He occasionally interjects the technical material with reflections about his philosophical convictions. His philosophical leaning is far less complicated than Ptolemy’s, for it is primarily based on Stoic ethics. His association of the Sun with Nous (1.1), for example, exhibits remnants of the Neopythagorean/Middle Platonic roots (see Plutarch), but his conscious justification for astrology is based on Stoicism. That which is in our power (eph’ hêmin), according to Stoic ethics, is how we adapt ourselves to fate and live in harmony with it. Valens argues that we cannot change immutable fate, but we can control how we play the role we are given (5.9). He quotes Cleanthes, Euripides, and Homer on Fate (6.9; 7.3), emphasizing that one must not stray from the appointed course of Destiny. Valens maintains a sense of “astral piety,” treating astrology as a religious practice, exemplified in the oath of secrecy upon the Sun, Moon, planets and signs of the zodiac in his introduction to Book 7. He asks his reader(s) to swear not to reveal the secrets of astrology to the uneducated or the uninitiated (tois apaideutois ê amuêtois), and to pay homage to one’s initial instructor, otherwise bad things will befall them. In Book 5.9, he provides a Stoic argument in favor of prognostication through astrology. He considers the outcomes that Fate decrees to be immutable, and the goddesses of Hope (Elpis) and Fortune (Tukhê) acting as helpers of necessity and enslave men with the desires created by the turns and expectations of fortune. Those however who engage with prognostication have “calmness of soul” (atarakhôn), do not care for fortune or hope, are neither afraid of death nor prone to flattery, and are “soldiers of fate” (stratiôtai tês heimarmenês). While other places, Valens gives techniques for katarchical astrology (5.3; 9.6) he states that no amount of ritual or sacrifice can alter that which is fated in one’s birth chart. He also considers the time of birth to account for dissimilar natures in two children born of the same parents. In keeping with his religious approach to astrology, he treats it as “a sacred and venerable learning as something handed over to men by god so they may share in immortality.” Like Ptolemy, Valens also blames the imperfections of predictions on the astrologers – particularly the inattentiveness and superficiality of some of the learners.
Ptolemy and Valens stand as representatives of astrology in the second century, but their works were not the most prominent. Astrological concepts were also used in magic, Hermeticism, Gnosticism, Gnostic Christian sects such as the Ophites, and by the author of the Chaldaean Oracles. Other known astrologers of the second century include Antiochus of Athens and Manetho (not to be confused with the Egyptian historian). One additional astrologer will be treated for his philosophical position, Firmicus Maternus. Though because he was influenced by Neoplatonic theories, he will be included below in the section on Neoplatonism.
Already mentioned is Pliny’s acceptance of some methods of astrology and rejection of others based on numerology. Similarly mentioned was Ptolemy’s rejection of various methods based on subdivisions of the zodiac and manipulations based on planetary numbers. Both he and Valens, as astrologers, criticized other practitioners for either shoddy methods or deliberate deception, posing their forms of divination as astrology. Valens went so far as to admonish those who dress up their “Barbaric” teachings in calculations as though they were Greek, perhaps in reference to the frequently maligned “Chaldaeans” (Anthologiarum, 2.35). Geminus of Rhodes, an astronomer of the mid-first century B.C.E., accepts some tenets of astrology, particularly the influence of aspects “geometrical relations” of planets, while rejecting others, such as the causal influence of emanations from fixed stars. Midde Stoic Panaetius is also known to have rejected astrology, most likely under the influence of his astronomer friend Scylax, who like other astronomers of the time, attempted to set the practice of astrology apart from astronomy. Arguments against astrology can be grouped into one of two categories (though there are other ways to classify them): ones that deny the efficacy of astrology or astrologers; and ones that admit that astrology “works” but question the morality of the practice. Arguments of the latter type include those that see astrology as a type of practice of living that assumes a strict fatalism. Some of the earliest arguments against astrology were launched by the skeptical New Academy in the second century B.C.E. Arguments against astrology on moral or ethical grounds would proliferate in Christian theologians such as Origen of Alexandria and other Church Fathers. Astrology would become an important issue for Neoplatonists, with some rejecting it and others embracing it, though not within a context of strict fatalism.
The earliest arguments against the efficacy of astrology have been traced to the fourth head of the skeptical New Academy, Carneades (c. 213-129 B.C.E.) (cf. Cramer, p. 52-56). As an advocate of free will, primarily against Stoic determinism, Carneades is likely to have influenced other philosophers who have argued against astrology. The arguments by Carneades, who left no writings, have been reconstructed as the following:
Astrologers would respond to the last argument with the incorporation of astro-geography or astro-chorography (perhaps as early as Posidonius), indicating an astral typology of a people, and used for the purpose of “mundane” astrology, predictions for entire nations, which would also account for the second argument. Astro-chorography can be found as early as Teukros of Babylon and Manilius, but might be traced to Posidonius’ predecessor Cratos of Mallos.
About three centuries later, Pyrrhonian skeptic Sextus Empiricus would elaborate upon these arguments in “Against the Astrologers” (Pros astrologous, Book 5 of Pros mathêmatikous). He first outlines the procedure of drawing a birth chart, and the basic elements of astrology, the places (topoi), the benefic and malefic nature of the planets, and the criteria for determining the power of the planets. He also notes the disagreements among astrologers, particularly regarding subdivisions of the signs, a disagreement also noted by Ptolemy. Sextus first notes typical arguments against astrology: 1) earthly things do not reallysympathize with celestial. He uses an example from anatomy, namely, the head and lower parts of body sympathize because they have unity, and this unity is lacking in celestial/earthly correspondence; 2) It is held that some events happen by necessity, some by chance, some according to our actions. If predictions are made of necessary events, then they are useless; if of chance events, then they are impossible; if of that according to our will (para hêmas), then not predetermined at all. If as he says, these are arguments by the majority, then there was an attack on the theory of cosmic sympathy and on the use of prediction (any form of divination) on events determined by any or all of the three causes. This precludes the possibility that the planets and stars are causes that determine necessity in the sublunary realm, and it presents astrology as a form of strict determinism. Sextus continues by offering a more specific set of criticisms, including the five thought to originate with Carneades. He especially focuses on the inaccuracy of instruments and measurements used for determining either the time of birth or conception. To these criticisms he adds that astrologers associate shapes and characters of men (tas morphas kai ta êthê) with the characteristics of the zodiac signs, and questions, for example, why a Lion could be associated with bravery while an equally masculine animal, the Bull, is feminine in astrology. He also ridicules physiognomic descriptions, such that those who have Virgo ascending are straight-haired, bright-eyed, white-skinned; he wonders if there are no Ethiopian Virgos. Sextus adds the argument that predictions from the alignment of planets cannot be based on empirical observation since the same configurations do not repeat for 9977 years (one calculation of the Great Year. Many such calculations exist in the Hellenistic and Late Hellenistic eras, for the exact length of the cycle was debated).
The “philosophical” Hermetica, texts in the Hermetic tradition that are typically of later origin than the “technical” astronomical and magical fragments, share astrological imagery in common with another heterogeneous group of texts known as “Gnostic.” (See more on Hermeticism and Gnosticism in Middle Platonism and Gnosticism). A factor present in both collections is the role planets and stars play in the cosmologies and eschatologies, one in which the planets and other celestial entities are seen as oppressive forces or binding powers from which the soul, by nature divine and exalted above the cosmo, must break free. Fate (Heimarmenê) plays a major role in the Hermetic texts, and astrology is sometimes taken for granted as knowledge of the Fate by which the mortal part of a human being is subjected to at birth (cf.Stobaei Hermetica, Excerpt VII). The planets are said to be subservient to Fate and Necessity, which are subordinate powers to God’s providence (pronoia). In the Poimandres text, God made man in his own image, but also made a creator god (demiurge) who made seven administrators (the planets) whose government is Fate. Man being two-fold, is both immortal, and above the celestial government, and mortal, so also a slave within the system, for he shares a bit of the nature of each of the planets. At death the soul of the individual who recognizes their immortal, intellectual, and divine self ascends, while gradually surrendering the various qualities accumulated during the descent: the body is given to dissolution; the character (êthos) is yielded to the daimon (cf. Heraclitus, Fr. 119); and through each the seven planetary zones, a portion of the incarnated self that is related to the negative astrological meaning of each planet (e.g., arrogance to the Sun, greed to Jupiter) is given back to that zone. Arriving at the eighth zone, the soul is clothed in its own power (perhaps meaning its own astral body), while it is deified (in God) in the zone above the eighth (some Gnostic texts also refer to a tenth realm). Astrological fatalism, then, is modified by the Platonic immortal soul whose proper place is above the cosmic order. Astrology affects the temperament and life while in the mortal body, but not ultimately the soul. Another Hermetic text that incorporates astrology is the Secret Sermon on the Mount of Hermes to Tat (Corpus Hermeticum, Book XIII). Here the life-bearing zodiac is responsible for creating twelve torments or passions that mislead human beings. These twelve are overcome by ten powers of God, such as self-control, joy and light. In Excerpt XXIII of the Stobaei Hermetica, the zodiac is again thought responsible for giving life (to animals) while each planet contributes part of their nature to human being. In this instance, as well as in Excerpt XXIX, what the planets contribute is not all vice, but both good and bad in a way that corresponds with the nature of each planet in astrological theory. The Discourses from Hermes to Tat is a discussion of the thirty-six decans, a remnant of Egyptian religion, which was incorporated into Hellenistic astrology. The decans are guardian gods who dwell above the zodiac, and added by servants and soldiers that dwell in the aether, they affect collective events such as earthquakes, famines and political upheaval. Furthermore, the decans are said to rule over the planets and to sow good and bad daimons on earth. Although Fate is an integral part of these Hermetic writings, it seems that the transmission of the Hermetic knowledge, which intends to aid the soul to overcome Fate, is for the elect, because most men, inclining towards evil, would deny their own responsibility for evil and injustice (Excerpt VI). This is a rehashing of the Lazy Man Argument used against Stoic determinism, though cast in the light of astral fatalism.
Hippolytus, being mostly informed by Irenaeus, tells us that the Christian Marcion and his followers used Pythagorean numerology and astrology symbolism in their sect, and that they further divided the world into twelve regions using astro-geography (6.47-48). They may have used a table of astro-numerology like that found in Teukros of Babylon. Some Gnostic sects such as the Phibionites, as did the Christian Marcionites associated each degree of the zodiac with a particular god or daimon. Single degrees of the zodiac (monomoiria) were governed by each planets. The astrologers assigned each degree to a planet by various methods as outlined in the compilation of Paul of Alexandria. For the Gnostics, the degrees were hypostatized as beings that did the dirty work of the planets, who themselves are governed by higher beings on the ontological scale as produced by the Ogdoad, and Decade, and Dodecade, and ultimately leading to a cosmic ruler or demiurge, typically called Ialdabaoth, though varying based on the specific version of the cosmo-mythology of each sect. It is likely that the astrologers and the Gnostics did not use these divisions in the zodiac in the same way. Assignment of planets to divisions of the zodiac is typically used in astrology for determining the relative strength of the planets, and in the case of Critodemus (cited in Valens, 8.26), in a technique for determining length of life. The monomoiria may have been used in the Gnostic and/or Hermetic writers for the sake of gaining knowledge of the powers that oppress in order to overcome them.
In the Chaldaean Oracles, a text of the second century and thought to bear the influence of Numenius, one finds a view of the cosmos similar to that found in the Hermetic corpus. However, the divine influences from above are mediated by Hecate, who separates the divine from the earthly realm and governs Fate. Fate is a force of Nature and the irrational soul of a human being is bound to it, but the theurgic practices of bodily and mental purification, utilizing the rational soul, is preparation for the ascent through the spheres, the dwelling place of the intelligible soul and the Father God. The Oracles share with the Gnostic and Hermetic texts a hierarchy of powers including the zodiac, planets and daimons.
Neoplatonism is typically thought to have originated with Plotinus; though his philosophy, like every Late Hellenistic philosophy and religion, did not develop in a vacuum. Plotinus was acquainted with the Middle Platonists Numenius and Albinus, as well as Aristotelian, Neopythagorean, Gnostic, and Stoic philosophies. Numenius (fl. 160-180 C.E.) shares with the Hermetic and Gnostic cosmologies the notion that the soul of human beings descends through the cosmos (through the Gateway of Cancer), loses memory of its divine life, and acquires its disposition from the planets. The qualities of the planets are again astrological, but vary by degree based on the distance from the intelligible realm – at the highest planetary sphere, Saturn confers reason and understanding, while at the lowest, the Moon contributes growth of the physical body. During the ascent, judges are placed at each planetary sphere; if the soul is found wanting, it returns to Hades above the waters between the Moon and Earth, then is reincarnated for ages until it is set right in virtue (based on the Myth of Er in Plato’s Republic 10.614-621).
The cosmological schemes, particularly the ontological hierarchies, in Middle Platonic, Gnostic and Neopythagorean thinkers typically allows for the place of astrology, if not in a strictly deterministic way for the entire human being, for the transcendent soul descends and ascends through the cosmos and one’s own actions determine future ontological status. This context places Neoplatonic philosophy in a difficult relationship with astrology and fatalism. Plotinus is unique in that he reverses the ontological status of the soul and the cosmos, for the All-Soul (World-Soul, Nous) is the creator and governor of the cosmos, but not a part of it. His philosophy, which exalts the soul above the cosmos and above the ordinance of time, forms the basis for some of his arguments against astrology.
Plotinus (204-270 C.E.) takes up the issue of astrology in Ennead 3.1 “On Fate,” and in more detail in the later Ennead 2.3, “Are the Stars Causes?” (chronologically, the 52nd treatise, or third from the last). In the first text, Plotinus points out that some hold the belief that the heavenly circuit rules over everything, and the configurations of the planets and stars determine all events within this whole fated structure (3.1.2). He then elaborates upon an astrology based on Stoic cosmic sympathy theory (sumpnoia), in which animals and plants are also under sympathetic influence of the heavenly bodies, and regions of the earth are likewise influenced (3.1.5). Many astrologers divided countries into astrological zones corresponding to zodiac signs (cf. Manilius Astronomica, 4.744-817). Plotinus briefly presents the arguments that for one, this strict determinism leaves nothing up to us, and leaves us to be “rolling stones” (lithous pheromenois – this recalls the rolling cylinder example in Stoicism). Secondly, he says the influence of the parents is stronger on disposition and appearance than the stars. Thirdly, recounting the New Academy argument, he says that people born at the same time ought to share the same fate (but do not). Given this, he does argue that planets can be used for predictive purposes, because they can be used for divination like bird omens (3.1.6; 3.3.6; 2.3.7-8). The diviner, however, has no place in calling them causes since it would take a superhuman effort to unravel the series of concomitant causes in the organism of the living cosmos, in which each part participates in the whole.
In Ennead 2.3, his arguments can be divided into two types, the first being a direct assault against the specific doctrines and language used by astrologers, the second concerning the roles that the stars have on the individual soul’s descent into matter, as he sees in accordance with Plato’s Timaeus and Republic10. In the first set of arguments, Plotinus displays more intimate familiarity with the language of technical astrology. He turns around the perspective of this language from the observer to the view from the planets themselves. He finds it absurd, for instance, that planets affect one another when they “see” one another and that a pair of planets could have opposite affections for one another when in the region of the other (2.3.4). Another example of the switched perspective is his criticism of planetary “hairesis” doctrine, such that each planet is naturally diurnal or nocturnal and rejoices in its chosen domain. He counters that it is always day for the planets. More pertinent to his philosophy, Plotinus then poses questions about the ontological status of the planets and stars. If planets are not ensouled, they could only affect the bodily nature. If they are ensouled, their effects would be minor, not simply due to the great distance from earth, but because their effects would reach the earth as a mixture, for there are many stars and one earth (2.3.12). Plotinus does think planets are ensouled because they are gods (3.1.5). Furthermore, there are no bad planets (as astrologers claim of Mars and Saturn) because they are divine (2.3.1). They do not have in their nature a cause of evil, and do not punish human beings because we have no effect on their own happiness (2.3.2). Countering moral characteristics that astrologers attribute to the zodiac and planets, Plotinus argues that virtue is a gift from God, and vice is due to external circumstances that happen as the soul is immersed in matter (2.3.9; 2.3.14).
Plotinus does concede that just as human beings are double in nature, possessing the higher soul and the lower bodily nature, so are planets. The planets in their courses are in a better place than beings on earth, but they are not themselves completely unchanging, like beings in the realm of Intellect (2.1). In this regard he attempts to square the contribution of the stars to one’s disposition in the Spindle of Fate in Plato’sRepublic 10, to his belief in free will. From the stars we get our character (êthê), characteristic actions (êthê praxeis) and emotions (pathê). He asks what is left that is “we” (hêmeis), and answers that nature gave us the power to govern (kratein) passions (pathôn) (2.3.9). If this double-natured man does not live in accordance with virtue, the life of the intellect that is above the cosmos, then “the stars do not only show him signs but he also becomes himself a part, and follows along with the whole of which he is a part” (2.3.9, tr. Armstrong).
In summary, Plotinus ridicules astrological technical doctrine for what he sees as a belief in the direct causality of the planets and stars on the fate of the individual. He also finds offensive the attribution of evil or evil-doing to the divine planets. However, he does believe that planets and stars are suited for divination because they are part of the whole body of the cosmos, and all parts are co-breathing (sumpnoia) and contribute to the harmony of the whole (2.3.7). The planets do not, then, act upon their own whims and desires.
Plotinus’ best-known student, Porphyry of Tyre (c. 232/3-304/5), held quite a different view on astrology. He wrote a lost work on astrology, Introduction to Astronomy in Three Books (the word “astronomy” meaning “astrology”), and put together an Introduction to Ptolemy’s Tetrabiblos (Eisagôgê eis tên Apotelesmatikên tou Ptolemaiou). In this work he heavily draws upon (and in some cases copies directly from) Antiochus of Athens, an astrologer of the late second century C.E. Antiochus’ influence was considerable, and perhaps greater than Ptolemy’s in the third and fourth centuries, since he was referenced by several later astrologers such as Firmicus Maternus, Hephaistion of Thebes, Rhetorius, and the medieval “Palchus.” It may be that Porphyry encountered Antiochus’ work when he studied in Athens under Longinus (another student of Ammonius Saccas) before continuing his Platonic education under Plotinus. Porphyry attempts to reconcile his belief in astrology with the Platonic belief in a free an exalted soul that is separable from the body. As a Pythagorean, Porphyry promoted abstinence from meat and other methods of detachment from the body as promoting virtue and a life of Nous. (cf. Launching Points to the Realm of the Mind; Letter to Marcella;On Abstinence). In an earlier work of which only fragments exist, Concerning Philosophy from Oracles, Porphyry asserts that gods and the demons use observations of the movements of stars to predict events decreed by Fate, a doctrine originating with the Stoics. He claims astrologers are sometimes incorrect in their predictions because they make faulty interpretations (while assuming that the principles of astrology itself are not false) (cf. Amand, p. 165-166; Eusebius Praeparatio evangelica, 6.1.2-5). In another fragment (Stobaeus, 2.8.39-42), Porphyry interprets Plato’s Myth of Er (Republic 10.614-621) as justification for the compatibility of astrology and free choice (Amand, p. 164-165). Before the souls descend to earth, they are free to choose their guardian daimon. When on earth, they are subject to Fate and necessity based on the lot chosen. Porphyry says this is in agreement with the (Egyptian) astrologers who think that the ascending zodiac sign (hôroskopos), and the arrangement of the planets in the zodiac signify the life that was chosen by the soul (Stobaeus, 2.8.39-42). He notes, as does Plotinus (Enn., 2.3.7), that the stars are scribbling on the heavens that give signs of the future. Both Porphyry and Plotinus discuss the Myth of Er and the stars as giving divinatory signs (sêmainô), but Porphyry accepts the astrological tradition filled with complicated calculations and strange language, while Plotinus rejects it.
Porphyry’s Introduction to Ptolemy’s Tetrabiblos contains little content from Ptolemy, and purports to fill in the terminology and concepts that Ptolemy had taken for granted. Porphyry says that by explicating the language in as simple a way as possible, these concepts will become clear to the uninitiated. His great respect for Ptolemy is evident by his other work on the study of Ptolemy’s Harmonics, and by statements that he makes of his debt, but he includes in the compilation numerous techniques that Ptolemy rejected. The debt he may be paying though, may actually be to readers of Plotinus. It may be a response to Plotinus’ criticism of the language of astrology and the belief that stars are causes. Porphyry seems to think that understanding the complicated scientific language will give back the credence to astrology that the naturalistic model by Ptolemy took away (at least for his most respected teacher).
In the Letter to Anebo, Porphyry poses a series of questions about the order of and distinctions between visible and invisible Gods and daimons, and about the mantic arts. He mentions the ability of some to judge, but the configurations of the stars, whether or not divinatory predictions will be true and false, and if theurgic activity will be fruitful or in vain (Epistula ad Anebonem, 2.6c – in reference to katarchical astrology). He also asks about the symbolism of the images of the Sun that change by the hour (these figures are twelve Egyptian forms that co-rise with the ascending signs of the zodiac. The dôdekaôrai. These uneven hours were measured by the time it took for each sign to rise; cf. Greek Magical Papryi, PGM IV 1596-1715). In this work, though, he complains of Egyptian priest/astrologers such as Chaeremon, who reduce their gods to forces of nature, do not allow for incorporeals, and hold to a strict deterministic astral fatalism (Epist. Aneb., 2.13a). Porphyry concludes with questions about the practice of astrologers of finding one’s own daimon, and what sort of power it imparts to us (Epist. Aneb., 2.14a-2.16a; cf. Vettius Valens, Book 3.1; Hephaistion, Apotelesmatica, 13; 20). Again, reconciling his notions of virtue and free will with astrology, he states that if it is possible to know one’s daimon (indicated by the planet derived through a set of rules and designated as the oikodespotês) from the birth chart, then one can be free from Fate. He notes the difficulties and disagreements among astrologers about how to find this all-important indicator. In fact, in Introduction to Ptolemy’s Tetrabiblos (30), he includes a lengthy chapter (again, borrowing from Antiochus of Athens) that explains a method for finding the oikodespotês) and for differentiating this from other ruling planets (such as the kurios and theepikratêtôr). As will be explicated, Iamblichus, who formed his own unique relationship to astrology, answered these questions in his De mysteriis.
While Iamblichus (c. 240-325 C.E.) believed in the soul’s exaltation above the cosmos, he did not, like Plotinus, think that the embodied soul of the human being is capable of rising above the cosmos and its ordering principle of Fate through simple contemplation upon the One, or the source of all things. Iamblichus responds to Porphyry’s accusation that Egyptian religion is only materialistic: just as the human being is double-natured, an incorporeal soul immersed in matter, this duality is replicated at each level of being (5.20). Theurgy, for most people, should begin with the material gods that have dominion over generation and corruption of bodies. He does not think the masses are capable of intellectual means of theurgy (this is reserved for the few and for a later stage in life), but that a theurgist must start at their own level of development and individual inclinations. His complex hierarchy of beings, including celestial gods, visible gods, angels and daimons, justifies a practice of theurgy in which each of these beings is sacrificed and prayed to appropriately, in a manner pleasing to and in sympathy with their individual natures. Material means, i.e., use of stones, herbs, scents, animals, and places, are used in theurgy in a manner similar to magical practices common in the Late Hellenistic era, with the notable difference that they are used simply to please and harmonize with the order of the higher beings, rather than to obtain either an earthy or intellectual desire. Divinity pervades all things, and earthly things receive a portion of divinity from particular gods.
Answering Porphyry’s question about the meaning of the Sun god seated on the Lotus (an Egyptian astrological motif), Iamblichus responds that the images that change with the zodiacal hours are symbolic of an incorporeal (and unchanging) God who is unfolded in the Light through images representing his multiple gifts. His position above the Lotus (which, being circular, represents the motion of the Intellect) indicates his transcendence over all things. Curiously, Iamblichus also says that the zodiac signs along with all celestial motions, receive their power from the Sun, placing them ontologically subordinate to it (De mysteriis, 7.3).
Next addressing Porphyry’s question about astral determinism of Chaeremon (who is thought to be a first century Alexandrian astrologer/priest versed in Stoic philosophy; cf. Porphyry, De abstinentia, 4.6; Origen Contra Celsum, 1.59; Cramer, p. 116-118) and others, Iamblichus indicates that the Hermetic writings pertaining to natal astrology play a minor role in the scope of Hermetic/Egyptian philosophy (De myst., 8.4) Iamblichus does not deny the value of natal astrology, but considers it to be concerned with the lower material life, hence subordinate to the intellectual. Likewise, not all things are bound to Necessity because theurgic exercises can elevate the soul above the cosmos and above Fate (8.7). On Porphyry’s question about finding one’s personal daimon through astrological calculation, Iamblichus responds that the astrological calculations can say nothing about the guardian daimon. Since the natal chart is a matter concerning one’s fatedness, and the daimon is assigned prior to the soul’s descent (it is more ancient; presbutera) and subjection to fate, such human and fallible sciences as astrology are useless in this important matter (9.3-4). In general, Iamblichus does not show much inclination for use of astrological techniques found in Ptolemy, Antiochus, and other astrologers, but he does believe that astrology is in fact a true science, though polluted by human errors (9.4). He also accepts and uses material correspondences to celestial gods (including planets), as well as katarchical astrology, observations used for selecting the proper times (8.4).
Julius Firmicus Maternus was a fourth century Sicilian astrologer who authored an astrological work in eight books, Matheseos, and about ten years later, a Christian polemical work, On the Error of Profane Religions (De errore profanarium religionum). Unlike Augustine (who studied astrology in his youth), Firmicus did not launch polemics against astrology after his conversion to Christianity He is mentioned briefly for his Neoplatonic justification for the practice of astrology. While he claims only meager knowledge in astrology, his arguments betray a passionate commitment to a belief in astral fatalism. He treats astrological knowledge as a mystery religion, and as Vettius Valens did before him, he asks his reader, Mavortius, to take an oath of secrecy and responsibility concerning astrological knowledge. He refers to Porphyry (along with Plato and Pythagoras) as a likeminded keeper of mysteries (7.1.1). In De errore, however, he attacks Porphyry for the same reason, that he was a follower of the Serapis cult of Alexandria (Forbes’ translation, p. 72). Firmicus’ oath is upon the creator god (demiurge) who is responsible for the order of the cosmos and for arranging the planets as stations along the way of the souls’ ascent and descent (7.1.2).
While outlining the arguments of astrology’s opponents, (including the first and second arguments of the New Academy, mentioned above), Firmicus claims not to have made up his mind concerning the immortality of the soul (Matheseos, 1.1.5-6), but he shortly betrays a Platonic belief in an immortal soul separable from the body (1.3.4). These souls follow the typical Middle Platonic ascent and descent through the planetary spheres; as a variation on this theme, he holds the notion that souls descend through the sphere of the Sun and ascend through the sphere of the Moon (1.5.9). This sovereign soul is capable of true knowledge, and, by retaining an awareness in spite of its forgetful and polluted state on Earth, can know Fate imperfectly through the methods of astrology handed down from Divine Mind (mentis treated as a Latin equivalent for nous, 1.4.1-5; 1.5.11). In response to the critics, he suggests that they do not have first hand knowledge and that if they encountered false predictions, the fault lies with the fraudulent pretenders to astrology and not with the science itself (1.3.6-8). For Firmicus, the planets, as administrators of a creator God, give each individual soul their character and personality (1.5.6-7).
After offering profuse praise of Plotinus, Firmicus attacks his belief that everything is in our powers and that superior providence and reason can overcome fortune. He argues that Plotinus made this claim in the prime of his health, but that he too accepted the powers of Fate toward the end of his life, since all efforts to advert poor health, such as moving to a better climate, failed him (1.7.14-18). Following this and other examples offered to his reader of fated events, he argues against the notion held by some, that fate (heimarmenê) only controls birth and death. This argument may be a precursor of the definition of fate that Hierocles offered a century later, which will be discussed next.
Hierocles of Alexandria is a fifth century Neoplatonist who argued against astrology, particularly an astrological theory based on a Stoic view of Fate and Necessity. He also rejected magical and theurgical practices prevalent in his time as a way to either escape or overcome the fate set down in one’s birth chart. His argument against these practices is based on his view of Providence and Fate, found in his work On Providence, which only survives in later summaries by ninth century Byzantine Patriarch, Photius. In general, Hierocles saw himself in line with the thinkers starting with Ammonius Saccas, who argue for the compatibility between Plato and Aristotle, while he rejects thinkers who emphasize their differences, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias. His view of Fate is that it is an immutable ordering of thinking according to divine Justice. Using, as do Plotinus and Porphyry, Plato’s Myth of Er (Rep., 10), fate is a system of rewards and punishments the souls choose before reincarnation on earth. He does not, though, like Porphyry, accept the transmigration of the soul from human to animal body and vice versa. This view on reincarnation had already been put forth by Cronius, a contemporary of Numenius (cf. Dillon, p. 380). He considers astrology to be contrary to this notion of Fate because it works by a principle of “mindless necessity” (enepilogiston anagkên). Photius writes of Hierocles:
He does not at all accept the irrational “necessity” spoken of by the astrologers, nor the Stoic “force,” nor even what Alexander of Aphrodisias supposed it to be, who identifies it with the nature of Platonic Bodies. Nor does he accept that one’ birth can be altered by incantations and sacrifices. (Codex 214, 172b, tr. Schibli, p. 333)
The astrological theory he is arguing against is supported by Stoic fate and necessity, which assumes a chain of physical efficient causes. The astrologers who most closely represent this view are Manilius and Vettius Valens (link to above sections). There is nothing in the surviving summary to indicate that Hierocles also argues against the notion of Plotinus and Porphyry that the stars are signs rather than causes, because they are part of the rational and divine order of all things. Since he believed there is nothing outside of rational Providence, including that which is in our power (to eph’ hêmin), the stars too would be a part of the rational ordering. His fate, being quite deterministic but based on moral justice, does not allow for magic and theurgic practices used to exonerate one from his Fate revealed through astrology (cf. Porphyry’s Letter to Anebo; Greek Magic Papyri, XIII, 632-640). These practices he saw as unlawful attempts to manipulate or escape the ordering of things by the Providence of God.
Proclus (410/11-485) was the director of the Platonic School at Athens, which called itself the “Academy” in order to maintain lineage with Plato’s fourth century school. In the absence of direct statements about the astrology, Proclus’ position on astral fatalism can be surmised through his philosophy, particularly his metaphysical hierarchy of beings. A paraphrase of Ptolemy’s astrological work, Tetrabiblos, is attributed to him, though there is little evidence to make a substantial claim about the identity of the author/copyist. Proclus did, however, take a keen interest in astronomy, and critiqued Ptolemy’s astronomical work,Syntaxis (or Almagest) in his Outline of Astronomical Hypotheses. In this work, he argues against Ptolemy’s theory of precession of the equinox (Hyp. astr., 234.7-22), although other Plato/Aristotle synthesizers, such as Simplicius, accepted it along with the additional spheres the theory would entail beyond the eighth (the fixed stars).
Proclus generally proposed three levels of being – celestial, earthly, and in-between. The four elements exist at every level of being, though fire (in the form of light) predominates in the celestial realm. Celestial beings are independent, self-subsistent, divine, and have their own will and power. As ensouled beings, celestial bodies are self-moving (the Platonic notion of soul). In order to maintain a consistency with Platonic doctrine, he argued against the notion that celestial spheres are solid paths upon which the planets and stars are carried along. Rather they are places possessing latitude, longitude, and depth (bathos – a measure of proximity to earth), which are projected by the free planets as their potential course. As visible gods, he thought the planets to be intermediaries between the intelligible realm and the sensible. In terms of planets being causes, he accepts the Aristotelian notion that they cause physical changes below (due to heat and light). However, he also accepted another type of non-physical causality, more akin to cosmic sympathy, in which several causes come together to form a single effect at a proper time and place. Everything lower in the hierarchy is dependent upon the higher, and is given its proper lot (klêros) and signature (sunthêma) of the higher beings. The celestial gods also have a ruling power over lower beings (Institutio theological, 120-122). This notion of properness (epitêdeiotês) extends from the celestial realm to all things below, including plants and metals (cf. Siovanes, p. 128-129). This is much akin to astrological theory, in which each planet and sign contributes, in varying proportions, to a single effect, the individual. The planetary gods are not the only actors, for they have invisible guardians (doruphoroi – not to be confused with the planets who guard the Sun and the Moon in astrological doctrine) who populate that the space of the planets’ courses, and who act as administrators. Proclus, though, is not a strict astral determinism, for as a theurgist, he also thought these allotments can be changed through theurgic knowledge (In Platonis Timaeum commentaria, 1.145).
Astrology’s relationship with early Christianity has a very complex history. Prior to being established as the official religion of the Roman Empire, the attitude of Jews and Christians toward astrology varied greatly. Philo of Alexandria and various Jewish pseudepigraphical writers condemned the practice of astrology (1 Enoch, Sibylline Oracles), while other texts accept portions of it and depict biblical figures such as Abraham and Noah as astrologers (cf. Barton, Ancient Astrology, p. 68-70). As mentioned above, early Christians such as Marcion and Basilides incorporated some aspects of astrology into their belief systems. In general, though, for the earliest Christian polemicists and theologians, astrology was incompatible with the faith for a number of reasons, mostly pertaining to the immorality of its fatalism. Some of the Christian arguments against astrology were borrowed from the skeptical schools. Hippolytus of Rome (170-236 C.E.) dedicating nearly an entire book (4) of his Refutations Against All Heresies, closely followed the detailed arguments from Sextus Empiricus, particularly concerning the lack of accurate methods for discerning the time of birth, which is required for establishing the natal chart. He is particularly troubled by the associations between signs of the zodiac and physiognomical features. Hippolytus outlines a list very similar to that of Teukros of Babylon (as contained in the latter’s De duodecim signis) containing correspondences between physiological and psychological characteristics; and he argues that the constellations were merely markers for star recognition, bear no resemblance to the animals by which they are named, and can bear no resemblance to human characteristics (Refutatio omnium haeresium, 4.15-27).
Bardaisan/Bardesanes (c 154-222 C.E.) was a converted Syriac Christian, who, like Augustine, studied astrology in his youth. It appears that in his conversion he did not give up all astrological thinking, for he accepts the role of the planets and stars as administrators of God. He wrote against astro-chorography, particularly the association of regions with planets based on seven climata or zones, stating that laws and customs of countries are based on institution of human free will and not on the planets. Along with free will, though, he accepts a degree of governance of nature and of chance, indicated by the limit of things in our control. Bardesanes is thought to be a forerunner of Mani, for he accepted a dualism of two world forces, dark and light (cf. Rudolf, Gnosis, p. 327-329).
Origen of Alexandria’s (185-254 C.E.) relationship to astrology was equally, if not more, complex than that of Plotinus. In his Commentary on Genesis he, in a manner similar to Plotinus, offers arguments against stars as causes, but in favor of stars as signs, divine writings in the sky. These writings are available for divine powers to gain knowledge and to participate in the providential aide of human beings (Philocalia, 23.1-23.21; cf. Barton, Power and Knowledge, p. 63-64). Origen believed that all beings, celestial, human or in-between, have the role of helping all creatures attain salvation. Celestial beings play a particular role in this cosmological paideia of educating creatures toward virtue. These signs, however, are imperfect at the human level, and cannot give exact knowledge (Philocalia, 23.6). Elsewhere (De oratione, 7.1), Origen urges us to pray for the Sun, Moon and stars (rather than to them), for they are also free beings (so he surmises by interpreting Psalm 148:3) and play a unique role in the salvation of the cosmos. Quite uniquely, Origen also appears to have been one of the first philosophers (if not the first) to use the theory of precession of the equinox as an argument against astrological prediction (Philocalia, 23.18).
Origen argued against those in antiquity who interpreted the Star of Bethlehem as an astrological prediction of the birth of Christ made by the Chaldaeans. He first notes that the Magi (from Persia) are to be distinguished from Chaldaeans (a word which at the time generally referred to Babylonian astrologers or simply astrologers). Secondly, he argues that the star was unlike any other astral phenomenon they had observed, and they perceived that it represented someone (Christ) superior to any person known before, not simply by the sign of the star, but by the fact that their usual sorcery and knowledge from evil daimons had failed them (Contra Celsum, 59-60). In general, regardless of the intentions of the gospel writers of including the myth of the Star of Bethlehem, it was interpreted by Christians not as a prediction by astrological methods of divination, but as a symbol of Christ transcending the old cosmic order, particularly fate oppressing the divinely granted human free will, and replacing it with a new order (cf. Denzey, “A New Star on the Horizon,” in Prayer, Magic, and the Stars, p. 207-221).
Three fourth century theologians, Gregory of Nyssa, Gregory Nazianzen, and Basil, known as the Cappadocians, rejected astrology as a part of an overall rejection of irrational Chance (Tukhê) and deterministic Necessity (Anankê) (see Pelikan, p. 154-157). Random chance had no place in the economy of God’s universe, while blind necessity denies human free will. They differentiated astrology from astronomy, which was an appropriate study for admiration of creation. Unlike Origen and Plotinus, Gregory Nazianzen rejected the notion of that stars give signs for reading the future. He feared that those who interpret the biblical notion that the stars were created for giving signs (Genesis 1:14) would use this as justification for horoscopic astrology (Pelikan, p. 156).
In the Latin west, Augustine (354-430 C.E.) took up polemics against astrology in conjunction with his arguments against divination (De civitate dei, 5.1-7). His distain for astrology is related to his early exposure to it as a Manichean prior to his conversion to Christianity. In De civitate dei (City of God), he borrowed freely from Cicero’s arguments against Stoic fate and divination. He particularly elaborated upon the New Academy argument that people born at the same time having different destinies (the twin argument). He includes in his attack on astrology the futility of katarchic astrology (choosing the proper moments for activities) as well as its contradiction with deterministic natal astrology. If persons are predestined by their natal charts, how can they hope to change fate by choosing the proper time for marriage, planting crops, etc? In addition, he attributes correct predictions by astrologers to occasional inspiration of evil daimons rather than the study of astrological techniques (De civ., 5.7).
As Christianity gained political and cultural ascendancy, decrees against astrology multiplied. With the closing of the “pagan” schools in 529, Neoplatonists and the astrology attached to them fled to Persia. Substantial debate exists about whether or not they set up a new school in Persia, specifically Harran, and likely, later, in Baghdad; but one thing that is certain is that astrological texts and astronomical tables (such as the Pinax of Ptolemy) used for casting charts were translated into Persian and adjusted for the sixth century. The astrological writings, particularly of Ptolemy, Dorotheus, and Vettius Valens, were then translated into Arabic and would become a part of Islamic philosophy. The Greek texts, in combination with developments in Persia and the astrology of India, would form the basis of medieval astrology. Astrology from that point on would continued its unique history, both combining with and striving against philosophical and scientific theories, up to the present day.
West Chester University of Pennsylvania
Last updated: March 27, 2005 | Originally published: March/27/2005
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