Autonomy is variously rendered as self-law, self-government, self-rule, or self-determination. The concept first came into prominence in ancient Greece (from the Greek auto-nomos), where it characterized city states that were self governing. Only later–during the European Enlightenment–did autonomy come to be widely understood as a property of persons. Today the concept is used in both senses, although most contemporary philosophers deal with autonomy primarily as a property of persons. This orientation will be maintained here.
Most people would agree that autonomy is normatively important. This agreement is reflected both in the presence of broad assent to the principle that autonomy deserves respect, and in the popular practice of arguing for the institution (or continuation, or discontinuation) of public policy based in some way on the value of self-determination. Many also believe that developing and cultivating autonomy is an important–indeed, on some accounts, an indispensable–part of living a good life. But although the claim that autonomy is normatively significant in some way is intuitively compelling, it is not obvious why autonomy has this significance, or what weight autonomy-based considerations should be given in relation to competing normative considerations. In order to answer these questions with sufficient rigor, it is necessary to have a more detailed understanding of what autonomy is.
This article will be devoted to canvassing the leading work done by philosophers on these two issues, beginning with the question of the nature of autonomy, and then moving to the question of the normative significance of autonomy. It will be seen that autonomy has been understood in several different ways, that it has been claimed to have normative significance of various kinds, and that it has been employed in a wide range of philosophical issues. Special attention will be paid to the question of justification of the principle of respect for autonomous choice.
The concept of autonomy first came into prominence in ancient Greece, where it characterized self-governing city-states. Barring one exception (mentioned below), autonomy was not explicitly predicated of persons, although there is reason to hold that many philosophers of that time had something similar in mind when they wrote of persons being guided or ruled by reason. Plato and Aristotle, for example–as well as many of the Stoics–surely would have agreed that a person ruled by reason is a properly self-governing or self-ruling person. What one does not find, however, are ancient philosophers speaking of the ideal of autonomy as that of living according to one’s unique individuality. The one exception to this appears to be found in the thinker and orator Dio of Prusa (ca. 50–ca. 120), who, in his 80th Discourse, clearly seems to predicate autonomy of individual persons in roughly the sense in which it has come to be understood in our own day (see Cooper 2003).
Medieval philosophers made no use of the concept of autonomy that is worthy of note, although once again, many medieval philosophers would have doubtless agreed that those who live in accordance with right reason and the will of God are properly self-governing. The concept of autonomy wouldn’t be circulated in learned circles again until the Renaissance and early modern times, when it was employed both in the traditional political sense, and in an ecclesiastical sense, to refer to churches that were–or at least claimed to be –independent of the authority of the Roman Catholic Pope (see Pohlmann 1971).
The concept of autonomy came into philosophical prominence for the first time with the work of Immanuel Kant. Kant’s work on autonomy, however, was strongly influenced by the writings of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, so a brief word on Rousseau is in order. Although Rousseau did not use the term ‘autonomy’ in his writings, his conception of moral freedom–defined as “obedience to the law one has prescribed to oneself”– has a clear relation to Kant’s understanding of autonomy (as will be shown below). Moreover, Rousseau wrote of moral freedom as a property of persons, thus presaging Kant’s predication of autonomy of persons. The connections between Rousseau and Kant cannot be taken too far, however; for Rousseau was primarily concerned with the question of how moral freedom can be achieved and sustained by individuals within society given the presence of relations of social dependency and the possibility of domination, whereas Kant was primarily concerned with the place of autonomy in accounts of the subjective conditions requisite for, and the nature of, morality. Because of the connections Kant drew between autonomy and morality, Kant’s conception of autonomy is sometimes referred to as ‘moral autonomy’.
In the nineteenth century, John Stuart Mill contributed to the discussion on the normative significance of autonomy in his work On Liberty. Although Mill did not use the term ‘autonomy’ in this work, he is widely understood as having had self-determination in mind. Mill’s work continues to have considerable influence on discussions on the normative significance of autonomy in relation to paternalism of various kinds.
A tremendous amount of research on autonomy has taken place in the last several decades in both the analytic and continental traditions. Continental philosophers speak more often of authenticity than of autonomy, but there are clear connections between the two, insofar as the ‘self’ in ‘self-determination’ is plausibly understood as the authentic self. Philosophers working in the analytic tradition have gone into great detail attempting to discern necessary and sufficient conditions for the presence of autonomy, as well as to uncover the ground and implications of its normative significance.
There are several different conceptions of autonomy, all of which are loosely based upon the core notions of self-government or self-determination, but which differ considerably in the details.
As mentioned, moral autonomy is associated with the work of Kant, and is also referred to as ‘autonomy of the will’ or ‘Kantian autonomy.’ This form of autonomy consists in the capacity of the will of a rational being to be a law to itself, independently of the influence of any property of objects of volition. More specifically, an autonomous will is said to be free in both a negative and a positive sense. The will is negatively free in that it operates entirely independently of alien influences, including all contingent empirical determinations associated with appetite, desire-satisfaction, or happiness. The will is positively free in that it can act in accordance with its own law. Kant’s notion of autonomy of the will thus involves, as Andrews Reath has written, “not only a capacity for choice that is motivationally independent, but a lawgiving capacity that is independent of determination by external influence and is guided by its own internal principle–in other words, by a principle that is constitutive of lawgiving” (Reath 2006). Now, because the lawgiving of the autonomous will contains no content given by contingent empirical influences, this lawgiving must be universal; and because these laws are the product of practical reason, they are necessary. Insofar, then, as Kant understood moral laws as universal and necessary practical laws, it can be seen why Kant posited an essential connection between the possession of autonomy and morality: the products of the autonomous will are universal and necessary practical laws–that is, moral laws. It is thus by virtue of our autonomy that we are capable of morality, and we are moral to the extent that we are autonomous. It is for this reason that Kant’s conception of autonomy is described as moral autonomy. Moral autonomy refers to the capacity of rational agents to impose upon themselves–to legislate for themselves–the moral law.
Furthermore, the capacity for autonomy, according to Kant, is “the basis of the dignity of human and of every rational nature;” and in accordance with this rational nature, is an end in itself. Furthermore, it “restricts freedom of action, and is an object of respect”. Many thinkers have followed Kant in grounding the dignity of persons (and respect for persons generally) in our capacity for autonomy (although it should be noted that not all of these thinkers have accepted Kant’s conception of autonomy). More will be said on this below.
Moral autonomy is said to be a bivalent property possessed by all rational beings by virtue of their rationality–although according to Kant, it is certainly possible not to live in accordance with its deliverances in practice (for more on Kant’s conception of autonomy, see Hill 1989, Guyer 2003, and Reath 2006).
One of the most common objections to this conception of autonomy is that such a robust form of independence from contingent empirical influences is not possible. Kant defended the possibility of such robust independence by arguing that human agents inhabit two realms at once: the phenomenal realm of experience, in relation to which we are determined; and a noumenal or transcendental realm of the intellect, in relation to which we are free. Given the further claim that our noumenal self can exercise efficient causality in the phenomenal realm, Kant held that our autonomy is in large part constituted by our noumenal freedom. The postulation of such a form of freedom may be criticized as metaphysically extravagant, however; and if such freedom is not possible, then neither is moral autonomy in Kant’s strict sense. Some thinkers have argued that Kant’s theorization on the noumenal realm was not meant to have metaphysical significance. Thomas Hill has argued, for example, that Kant may have been merely elaborating on the practical conditions in which we must understand ourselves insofar as we conceive ourselves as free. Objectors have insisted, however, that Kant intended to assert the more robust form of metaphysical freedom. Indeed, it could be pressed, he must have; for without this sense of freedom being operative, actual autonomy–and hence morality, by Kant’s lights–would not be possible.
Existentialist autonomy is an extreme form of autonomy associated principally with the writings of Jean Paul Sartre. It refers to the complete freedom of subjects to determine their natures and guiding principles independently of any forms of social, anthropological or moral determination. To possess existentialist autonomy is thus to be able to choose one’s nature without constraint from any principles not of one’s own choosing. Sartre held this radical freedom to be entailed by the truth of atheism. According to Sartre, God’s nonexistence entails two key conclusions: firstly, humans cannot have a predetermined nature; and secondly, there cannot exist a realm of values possessing independent validity. Taken together, this entails that human beings are radically free: “For if indeed existence precedes essence, one will never be able to explain one’s action by reference to a given and specific human nature; in other words, there is no determinism–man is free, man is freedom. Nor, on the other hand, if God does not exist, are we provided with any values or commands that could legitimize our behavior. Thus we have neither behind us, nor before us in a luminous realm of values, any means of justification or excuse.” Fettered neither by a predetermined nature nor by an independently existing order of values, “[m]an is nothing else but what he makes of himself” (Sartre 1946).
Like moral autonomy, existentialist autonomy is a bivalent property which all human persons are said to possess (although possibly without being aware of this). Unlike moral autonomy, however, existentialist autonomy has no necessary connections to morality or to rationality as traditionally conceived.
The primary objection to existentialist autonomy is that it is too radical to be plausible. Even if God does not exist, it is argued, it does not follow that humans lack a nature that determines–at least to some extent–their choices, tendencies, proclivities, and guiding principles. A thoroughly naturalistic conception of human nature, informed by an understanding of the evolutionary forces operative in human psychology, seems to militate against the notion that humans are as unbounded as existentialist autonomy suggests we are. At the very least, it could be argued that empirical evidence does not speak in favor of the existence of existentialist autonomy in any robust form.
Without question, the majority of contemporary work on autonomy has centered on analyses of the nature and normativity of personal autonomy. Personal autonomy (also referred to as ‘individual autonomy’) refers to a psychological property, the possession of which enables agents to reflect critically on their natures, preferences and ends, to locate their most authentic commitments, and to live consistently in accordance with these in the face of various forms of internal and external interference. Personally autonomous agents are said to possess heightened capacities for self-control, introspection, independence of judgment, and critical reflection; and to this extent personal autonomy is often put forth as an ideal of character or a virtue, the opposite of which is blind conformity, or not ‘being one’s own person.’
As mentioned above, personal autonomy has an essential relation to authenticity: the personally autonomous agent is the agent who is effective in determining her life in accordance with her authentic self. Personal autonomy is thus constituted, on the one hand, by a cluster of related capacities (often termed ‘authenticity conditions’), centered on identifying one’s authentic nature or preferences and, on the other hand, by a cluster of capacities (often termed ‘competency conditions’) that are centered on being able effectively to live in accordance with these throughout one’s life in the face of various recalcitrant foreign influences. These capacities may be possessed singly or in unison, and often require a considerable amount of life experience to assume robust forms.
One of the most intractable problems surrounding personal autonomy concerns the analysis of the authentic self (the ‘self’ in ‘self-determination’, as it were). Some philosophers have claimed that no such self exists; and indeed, some philosophers claim that no self exists at all (for an overview of these problems, see Friedman 2003 and Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000). Most philosophers accept the possibility of the authentic self at least as a working hypothesis, however, and concentrate attention on the question of how authenticity is secured by an agent. The most popular and influential account is based on the work of Harry Frankfurt and Gerald Dworkin. According to their ‘hierarchical’ account, agents validate the various commitments (beliefs, values, desires, and so forth) that constitute their selves as their own by a process of reflective endorsement. On this account, agents are said to possess first-order and second-order volitions. Our first-order volitions are what we want; and our second-order volitions are what we want to want. According to the hierarchical model, our first-order desires, commitments, and so on are authentic when they are validated by being in harmony with our second-order volitions: that is, when we want what we want to want. Following from this model, an agent is autonomous in relation to a given object when the agent is able to determine her first-order volitions (and corresponding behavior) by her second-order volitions. A simple example may help to illustrate the model. Say that I am a smoker. Although I enjoy lighting up, I do not reflectively endorse my smoking; I desire it, but I do not want to desire it. On the hierarchical model, smoking is not an aspect of my authentic self, because I do not reflectively endorse it; and to the extent that I am unable to change my habits, I am not autonomous in relation to smoking. Conversely, if I can bring my first-order volitions into harmony (or identity) with my second-order volition, then my desire is authentic because it is reflectively endorsed; and to the extent that I can mold my behavior in accordance with my reflective will, I am autonomous in relation to smoking. Persons who possess the requisite capacities to form authentic desires and effectively to generally live in accordance with them are autonomous agents according to this model (see Frankfurt 1971, 1999 and Dworkin 1988).
The hierarchical model remains–in outline, at least–the leading account of authenticity undergirding most contemporary accounts of personal autonomy, although it has been attacked on many fronts. The primary objection tendered against this account is ‘the problem of origins.’ As we have seen, authentic selfhood as reflective endorsement holds that my authentic self is the self that I reflectively ratify: the self that I endorse as expressing, in a deep sense, who I fundamentally am or wish to be. The problem of origins arises when one attempts to explain how this act of reflective endorsement actually constitutes a break from other-determination (that is, from foreign influence). For, could it not be the case that what appears to me to be an independent act of reflective endorsement is itself conditioned by other-determining factors and therefore ultimately an other-determined act? If this is the case, then it doesn’t seem that the possession of autonomy or the making of autonomous choices is possible. In short, the problem is how to sustain an account of self-determination that is not threatened by the pervasive effects of other-determination (see Taylor 2005 for elaboration on the problem of origins and related sub-problems). Much work on theories of personal autonomy has been explicitly devoted to addressing precisely these sorts of difficulties.
Besides analyzing and clarifying the authenticity conditions necessary for autonomy, philosophers have also worked on providing a thorough account of the competency conditions necessary for the presence of autonomy (see Meyers 1989, Mele 1993, and Berofsky 1995). Competency conditions, as we have seen, are those capacities or conditions that need to be present in order for one to be effective in living according to one’s authentic self-conception in the face of various kinds of interference to that end. Examples of competency conditions include self-control, logical aptitude, instrumental rationality, resolve, temperance, calmness, and a good memory.
In addition to authenticity and competency conditions, many theories of personal autonomy require the presence of certain external enabling conditions: that is, external or environmental (social, legal, familial, and so forth) conditions which are more than less out of the agent’s control, but which must be in place in order for fully autonomous living to be possible. Such enabling conditions include, for example, a modicum of social freedom, an array of substantive options for choice, the presence of authenticity-oriented social relations, and autonomy-supporting networks of social recognition and acknowledgment (see Raz 1986 and Anderson & Honneth 2005). Without these conditions, effective autonomous living is said by some to be impossible, even where authenticity and competency conditions are robustly satisfied. Different autonomy theorists place different emphases on external enabling conditions. Some contend that external enabling is a necessary condition for autonomy (see Oshana 1998). Others hold that autonomy more properly concerns agential satisfaction of authenticity and competency conditions, regardless of whether the external environment allows for actual autonomous expression (see Christman 2007). Both views can claim some intuitive support. On the one hand, it is reasonable to hold that it is only fitting to call a person ‘autonomous’ if that person is in fact effective in living according to her authentic self-conception. Yet, it also makes sense to call persons ‘autonomous’ who have formed an authentic self-conception and possess the requisite competency conditions effectively to express that self-conception, but happen to lack the contingent socio-relational conditions that allow for the expression of that authentic self. A possible solution to this impasse may be to avoid seeking hard and fast borders to the existence of autonomy, and say that autonomy is present in both cases, but is more robust where the proper external enabling conditions are in place.
The question of normative commitments associated with personal autonomy possession has also been a matter of some dispute. Many philosophers hold that autonomy is normatively content-neutral. According to this account, one (or one’s commitments) can be autonomous regardless of the values one endorses. On this account, one could commit to any kind of life–even the life of a slave–and still be autonomous (see, for example, Friedman 2003). Other philosophers hold that autonomy possession requires substantive normative constraints of some kind or other–at the very least, it is argued that one must value autonomy in order to be truly autonomous (see Oshana 2003). As with the debate just mentioned, both sides of this debate can claim some intuitive support; this can be shown through the asking of opposing but seemingly equally compelling (apparently rhetorical) questions; namely, ‘Can’t one autonomously choose whatever one wants?’, and, ‘How can we call someone autonomous who doesn’t value or seek autonomous living?’ One possible solution to this debate is to say that while almost any individual choice can be autonomous, persons cannot live autonomous lives as a whole without some commitment to the value of autonomy.
Unlike moral and existentialist autonomy, personal autonomy is possessed in degrees, depending on the presence and strength of the constellation of internal capacities and external enabling conditions that make it possible. While not all persons possess personal autonomy, it is commonly claimed that virtually everyone–with the exception of the irredeemably pathological and the handicapped–possesses the capacity for personal autonomy. In addition, the links between personal autonomy possession and moral agency are usually said to be thin at best. Even those who hold that personal autonomy possession requires substantive normative commitments of some kind (such as, for example, a commitment to the value of autonomy itself), they usually hold that it is quite possible to be an autonomous villain. Some philosophers have argued that personal autonomy possession requires the presence of normative competency conditions that effectively provide agents with the capacity to distinguish right from wrong (see Wolf 1990), but this strong account is in general disfavor, and even if the account is correct, few would argue that this means that personally autonomous agents must also always act morally. In the face of this, one may wonder why autonomy-based claims are said to generate demands of respect upon others. This question will be dealt with in more detail in section 4 below.
Lastly, a word should be given on the relation between personal autonomy and freedom (or liberty, which is here taken to be synonymous with freedom). Although it is not uncommon to find the terms ‘(personal) autonomy’ and ‘freedom’ used essentially synonymously, there are some important differences between them.
More often than not, to claim that a person is free is to claim that she is negatively free in the sense that she is not constrained by internal or external forces that hinder making a choice and executing it in action. There is a clear distinction between autonomy and negative freedom, however, given that autonomy refers to the presence of a capacity for effective authentic living, and negative freedom refers to a lack of constraints on action. It is entirely possible for a person to be free in this negative sense but nonautonomous, or–on accounts that do not require the presence of external enabling conditions for autonomy to be present–for a person to be autonomous but not (negatively) free.
Some writers also speak of positive freedom, and here the connections with autonomy become much deeper. Speaking very generally, to be free in this sense is to possess the abilities, capacities, knowledge, entitlements or skills necessary for the achievement of a given end. For example, I am only (positively) free to win an Olympic gold medal in archery if I am extremely skilled in the sport. Here it should be clear that one can be positively free in many ways and yet not be autonomous. Some philosophers, however, following Isaiah Berlin (Berlin 1948), have described positive freedom in such a way that it becomes basically synonymous with personal autonomy. Like autonomy, the conception of freedom that is operative in a given discussion can vary considerably; but more often than not personal autonomy is distinguished from freedom by the necessary presence, in the former, of a connection to the authenticity of the agent’s self-conception and life-plan–a connection that is usually not found in conceptions of freedom.
Lastly, autonomy is sometimes spoken of in a manner that is more directly normative than descriptive. In political philosophy and bioethics especially, it is common to find references to persons as autonomous, where the autonomy referred to is understood principally as a right to self-determination. In these contexts, to say that a person is autonomous is largely to say that she has a right to determine her life without interference from social or political authorities or forms of paternalism. Importantly, this right to self-directed living is often said to be possessed by persons by virtue either of their potential for autonomous living or of their inherent dignity as persons, but not by virtue of the presence of a developed and active capacity for autonomy (see Hill 1989). Some have argued that political rights (Ingram 1994) and even human rights generally (Richards 1989) are fundamentally based upon respect for the entitlements that attend possessing the capacity for autonomy.
Although disagreements concerning the nature of autonomy are rife, almost no one disagrees that autonomy has normative significance of some kind; and this agreement is found both in relation to the claim that autonomy is normatively significant for the autonomous agent and to the claim that autonomy is normatively significant for the addressees of autonomy-based demands. Following from this, autonomy plays an important normative role in a variety of philosophical areas.
Autonomy is referenced or invoked in a number of key ways in ethical theory:
(i) Autonomy serves as a ground for the claims that persons have dignity and inherently deserve basic moral respect
(ii) Autonomy is said to have a value that grounds the claim that persons deserve to be told the truth
(iii) Autonomy is referenced as a fundamental principle of ethics in Kantian deontology
(iv) Autonomy is commonly viewed as a key component of human well-being (and is therefore significant for utilitarianism)
(v) Autonomy is defended as an important virtue
(vi) Autonomy is said to be necessary for moral responsibility
(vii) Autonomy is said to have a value that grounds the claim that autonomy-based demands are worthy of special respect
(i) Ever since Kant, autonomy (or the capacity for autonomy) has been referenced by some philosophers as that property of human beings by virtue of which they possess inherent dignity and therefore inherently deserve to be treated with basic moral respect. Kant’s justification for the claim that autonomy grounds the inherent dignity of persons was based on the view that it is by virtue of our autonomy that we are ends-in-ourselves. Beings that lack autonomy are, precisely because of this lack, essentially at the mercy of the determinism that characterizes the phenomenal realm: they are controlled by forces that have nothing to do with their own will. Beings that possess autonomy on the other hand, are, precisely because of this possession, free from this determination; they have the capacity for freedom through the active exercise of their autonomous wills, which allows for the legislation of universal law. Autonomous agents are not passive players in life; they are active agents, determining themselves by their own will, the authors of the laws that they follow (see Guyer 2003). As such, they are not passive means towards nature’s determined ends, but are ends-in-themselves, by virtue of which they possess inherent dignity and deserve basic moral respect. Many have followed Kant in referencing autonomy as the ground of human dignity and as the basis of the basic moral respect owed to persons, although not all have followed Kant in the details of his account (for a recent account that moves away from Kant’s conception of noumenal freedom, see Korsgaard 1996). The most common objection leveled against this account is that it runs into problems involving exclusion. Most would argue that the mentally handicapped, for example, are owed basic moral respect, even if they do not possess (even the capacity for) autonomy. And if human dignity is indexed to the presence of autonomy, it is argued, this would entail, counter-intuitively, that those who are more autonomous have more dignity, and are more worthy of respect. It may also be argued that the capacity for autonomy is a poor ground for human dignity (and respect for persons) for other reasons–for example, because autonomy has no essential connection to morality, or because better grounds are available, or because the very project of grounding human dignity on a property of some kind is ill-conceived. Despite these worries, however, appeals to autonomy as a basis for human dignity and basic moral respect remain quite popular.
(ii) Some philosophers have argued that a proper appreciation for others as autonomous (or as possessing the capacity for autonomy) requires that one not seek to deceive them. Respect for autonomy is thus said to have an important relation to truthfulness. In Thomas Hill’s words, “Lies often reflect inadequate respect for the autonomy of the person who is deceived.” (Hill 1991) We saw above that autonomy’s value has been used to ground the basic moral respect owed to persons; and the present injunction against deception may be viewed as a specific form that autonomy-based respect for persons may take. It is easy to see why a connection between respect for autonomy and truthfulness (or what comes to the same thing–an injunction against deception) has been attractive to some philosophers, especially those in the Kantian tradition. When we deceive others for our own purposes, we bypass their reflective abilities and make them instruments in the achievement of our own ends, and in doing this we fail to treat them as persons capable and deserving of self-determination. Proper respect for persons as autonomous thus requires a commitment to truthfulness. It has been argued, however, that one may respect and value the autonomy of another while deceiving them at the same time (Buss 2005). One may, for example, use forms of deception so that another’s capacity for autonomy may flourish. The basic idea here is that one may still reason for oneself despite being deliberately influenced by the deceptive behavior of others. As Sarah Buss writes, “To put it somewhat crudely, whether an instance of practical reasoning is self-determined is a matter of whether it is really the agent herself who is doing the reasoning. And this would seem to depend on whether she determines her response to the considerations that figure in her reasoning–not on how the considerations to which she responds relate to reality, nor on how she came to be aware of these considerations.” It may be argued, however, that the conception of autonomy underlying this claim is too thin to be acceptable, and that a better conception would contain the resources necessary to judge self-determining reasoning influenced by the deliberate deception of another as nonautonomous. In this vein, some have argued that a person is autonomous in relation to a given desire or choice only if that person would not feel alienated from the causal process that gave rise to that desire or choice (Christman 2007). On the assumption that persons would feel alienated from deceptive desire- or choice-forming processes, the associated desires or choices would not count as autonomous. In response to this, however, it may be argued that autonomous agents may not feel alienated from all (or many) deceptive forms of influence upon the formation of their desires and choices, depending on the circumstances (Buss 2005). If this were the case, then a commitment to the value of autonomy may not be inconsistent with certain forms of deception or manipulation. Yet, given the traditional opposition between autonomous self-determination and agential determination rooted in deceit and manipulation, it is to be expected that resistance to the notion that they are not incompatible will continue.
(iii) Autonomy plays a key role in Kant’s deontological ethics. We have already seen this in the way in which Kant grounds human dignity in autonomy. But autonomy plays a further (and closely related) normative role for Kant. It is often said that Kant held that the Categorical Imperative can be expressed in three closely related formulas: the Formula of Universal Law, the Formula of Humanity, and the Formula of the Kingdom of Ends. It has also been claimed, however, that Kant defended a fourth formula, which may be called the Formula of Autonomy. Although Kant did not state this formula explicitly, it has been argued that it can be plausibly derived from his description of the Categorical Imperative as “the idea of the will of every rational being as a will that legislates universal law.” The corresponding Formula of Autonomy could then be expressed as an imperative in this way: act so that the maxims you will could be the legislation of universal law. According to this formula, we should act according to principles that express the autonomy of the will. This formulation is important, firstly because it suggests that Kant conceived autonomy as a normative principle (and not merely as a condition of the will that makes morality possible), and secondly because it further reinforces Kant’s claim that humans, as autonomous law-givers, are the source of the universal law that guarantees their freedom and hence marks them out as possessing inherent dignity (see Reath 2006).
(iv) Autonomy is commonly held to be a core component of well-being. This view goes back at least to Mill’s On Liberty, and has been accepted by many contemporary philosophers as well (see for example Griffin 1986 and Sumner 1996). In this connection, some argue that autonomy is an intrinsic part of well-being, and others argue that being autonomous reliably leads to well-being (and hence has instrumental prudential value). Although thus far, the normative importance of autonomy has been described as being associated primarily with deontology, the claim that autonomy is a core component of well-being shows that it can play a key role in consequentialist moral theories as well. Indeed, as will be discussed in greater detail below (section 4), although most defenses of the principle of respect for autonomy are deontological in nature, it is also possible to defend the principle on consequentialist grounds. From this point of view, it can be argued that autonomy deserves respect because respecting autonomy is reliably conducive to well-being.
(v) Autonomy has been claimed to be an important virtue to possess. It is not difficult to see why this is the case. The autonomous person is a person possessing a constellation of widely desirable qualities such as self-control, self-knowledge, rationality and reflective maturity. To be autonomous is to be self-governing; to be free from domination by foreign influences over one’s character and values; to ‘be one’s own person’. Following from this, it is claimed by some that autonomy is a great virtue to possess – one which constitutes an important part of human flourishing. It may be objected, however, that an excessive concern with autonomy can be at odds with virtue, especially if robust autonomy entails an inability to exhibit loyalty or fidelity to projects, other persons or communities. Recent work on personal autonomy, however, has tended to support the notion that autonomy possession is not incompatible with these and similar forms of attachment (Friedman 2003).
(vi) Autonomy has been seen by some thinkers as having implications for a correct account of moral responsibility. Some accounts hold that autonomy is a necessary condition for moral responsibility. The basic defense of this claim is that it makes little sense to say that someone is morally responsible for her actions if she is not the author of those actions; and since one is the author of one’s actions only if one is autonomous, autonomy possession is necessary for moral responsibility. According to this account, the class of actions that are autonomous and the class of actions for which we are morally responsible are identical, or at least almost so (see Fischer and Ravizza 1998). Other accounts hold that although persons are certainly morally responsible for their autonomous actions, they are also morally responsible for a wider range of actions as well. An account of this sort is often made by those who hold a more demanding conception of autonomy; and defenders of this account argue that we still want to hold persons morally responsible for the many actions that do not satisfy robust autonomy conditions on the one hand, but are not constituted of sheer heteronomy (brainwashing, psychosis, coercion, and so forth) on the other (see Arpaly 2005).
(vi) Many thinkers believe that autonomous claims or demands are worthy of special normative uptake–special respect–by virtue of the fact that they are autonomous. It is important to see how this claim is different from the first point given above (viz., that autonomy is said to ground basic moral respect for persons). The former claim is that the fact that persons are autonomous (or have the capacity for autonomy) is what grounds their special dignity, by virtue of which they are owed basic moral respect. Now, it is possible to owe someone basic moral respect, but not to owe special respect to a subset of their choices. Imagine that someone is brainwashed, for example. Many would argue that although we owe that person basic moral respect (for example, we are obligated, say, not to harm them or to lie to them), we do not owe special respect to that person’s demands (say, to promote or not interfere with those demands). The current claim holds, however, that the fact that a person’s choices are autonomous generates special demands of respect for those choices over and above the basic respect owed to the chooser (whether this be conceived as being by virtue of their capacity for autonomy or not). This principle–that autonomous choice deserves special respect–may be justified in either a deontological or consequentialist manner. Because of the considerable importance of this principle, however, it deserves a more detailed discussion, which is provided in section 4 below.
The principle of respect for autonomy has had a considerable influence on applied ethics largely because of its versatility: it can be invoked in any applied ethics debate that bears (even remotely) on morally significant situations that involve the demands of self-determination, free choice, authenticity or independence. Seven of the most important of these debates–certainly not an exhaustive list–will be briefly canvassed below:
(i) Autonomy and informed consent
(ii) Autonomy and abortion
(iii) Autonomy and end-of-life decisions
(iv) Autonomy and same-sex marriage
(v) Autonomy and just war theory
(vi) Autonomy and advertising
(vii) Autonomy and environmental ethics
(i) Respect for autonomy has had a major influence on debates in medical ethics, especially those concerning the constraints that should be in place within the physician-patient relationship. Perhaps the most important such constraint is that of informed consent. According to this principle, a patient should not receive medical treatment of any sort unless she is well-informed enough as to the treatment’s nature and effects to be able to make an informed decision about it. The patient must agree to the treatment on the basis of this information. Many have argued that the requirement of informed consent is necessitated as part and parcel of a more basic imperative to respect patient autonomy (Dworkin 2006). Few argue that respecting patient autonomy has no weight at all; more commonly, objectors argue that there are cases in which overriding patient autonomy is sometimes justified by the good consequences that will likely result from doing so.
(ii) Autonomy is also referenced as an important value to be taken into consideration in the abortion debate, although it is referenced in different ways. On the one hand, it is argued that some abortions are justified as an expression of a woman’s reproductive autonomy (see Overall 1990 and Fischer 2003). On the other hand, it could be argued that abortion is morally unacceptable, among other reasons, because it fails to respect the potential future autonomy of the aborted (for a related argument, see Marquis 1989). Assuming that both of these autonomy-based arguments have weight, adjudicating this dispute requires–among other things–establishing and defending the relative weights of actual and potential autonomy, both in relation to particular choices and in relation to lives as wholes.
(iii) Many argue that considerations of respect for autonomy are also decisive in the debates concerning the moral acceptability of euthanasia and suicide. Respect for autonomy can be viewed as a reason for accepting voluntary euthanasia. The basic argument here is one of consistency: if respect for others’ autonomy requires respecting others’ self-determining life-choices (at least when these are competently made), and if end-of-life decisions are placed within the ambit of life-choices, then end-of-life decisions made by competent, autonomous persons should be respected, even if these decisions involve voluntary euthanasia (for a related argument, see Brock 1993). Some have cast doubt, however, on whether a decision to die can be an autonomous decision at all, given the likely presence of psychological factors such as fear, hopelessness, and despair–factors which would undermine careful introspection and critical thought (Hartling 2006). Respect for autonomy can also be seen as a reason for respecting the decision to end one’s life, even when reasons of mercy are not in play–that is, in cases of suicide–at least where there is reason to hold that the agent is sufficiently competent and rational (Webber & Shulman 1987). Some argue, however, that autonomy-based defenses of voluntary euthanasia and suicide involve a contradiction insofar as they invoke the value of autonomy to justify an act that destroys autonomy (Safranak 1988 and Doerflinger 1989). If correct, these arguments do not show that voluntary euthanasia or suicide are unacceptable; they show rather that arguments to establish their acceptability cannot be based on respect for autonomy. It may be a cause of worry, however, that such arguments prove too much by rendering unacceptable autonomy-based respect for any decision that involves a subsequent lessening of free choice.
(iv) Autonomy also carries normative weight in a number of applied ethics debates relating to public policy. Respect for autonomy can be straightforwardly referenced, for example, as an argument in favor of the acceptability of same-sex marriage: respect for others’ autonomy entails respect for their autonomous decisions, and decisions regarding marriage–even same-sex marriage–fall within these parameters (when autonomous). Objectors might argue, however, that homosexual marriage is immoral, and that the right to noninterference with autonomous choice does not exist where the object of the choice is immoral. Few would argue, for example, that there exists an obligation to respect someone’s autonomous decision to embezzle money, given that that act is immoral. The question then becomes whether same-sex marriage is morally acceptable.
(v) Respect for autonomy also plays a role in discussions of a just-war theory. Specifically, it has been referenced as the key principle determining the proper constraints and limitations that should be in place if we wish our prosecution of war to be just. It has been argued, for example–and in partial conjunction with what has been said above–that possession of autonomy (or the existence of a capacity for it) is the ground of human dignity, and hence the actions which appreciate that dignity must center on respect for autonomy. In relation to war, this suggests that while war may sometimes be morally permissible (in cases of self-defense, for example), wartime actions cannot involve violations of others’ autonomy, especially that of noncombatants (for an extended discussion, see Zupan 2004).
(vi) In business ethics, respect for autonomy has been identified as a key reason why persuasive advertising practices are morally unacceptable (Crisp 1987). The arguments given in support of this claim largely follow those mentioned above in relation to truthfulness–viz. that respect for others’ autonomy is incompatible with deception or manipulation–combined with the claim that persuasive advertising practices constitute deception or manipulation. In this vein it has also been argued that persuasive advertising undermines consumer autonomy by creating foreign desires and wants and by producing compulsive behavior in consumers. Some have argued, however, that persuasive advertising practices do not threaten consumers’ autonomy, at least not necessarily or intrinsically (Arrington 1982). From this point of view, although such deception may occur, this is the exception; usually it provides consumers with the information necessary for making informed decisions. It has also been argued that, even if persuasive advertising thwarts autonomy, it is still in consumers’ interests to be exposed to it, given that companies would likely only go to such trouble for products that will be market-winners, and hence that consumers would have desired and bought those products anyway, even after careful consideration (Nelson 1978). One obvious problem with this argument is that it assumes that heavy persuasive marketing is a sign of product quality, which is certainly debatable; but even if that premise is granted, it may still be argued that rhetorical device laden advertising, by attempting to bypass consumers’ critical thinking abilities, violates their autonomy.
(vii) Respect for autonomy has even been referenced in relation to issues in environmental ethics. Eric Katz has argued, for example, that nature as a whole constitutes an ‘autonomous subject’, which therefore deserves moral respect and should not be treated as a mere means to the satisfaction of human ends (Katz 1997). Critics of this view may wonder whether the notion of an autonomous subject operative here has been stretched to breaking point, or rendered hollow. If correct, this criticism does not, of course, entail that prohibitions against using nature as a mere means to human ends cannot be provided; it simply means that an acceptable defense cannot be based on autonomy-related considerations.
It should be clear from the breadth and diversity of the employment of the principle of respect for autonomy that it is both, extremely versatile and a mainstay of applied ethics debates. The brief sketches given above concern some of the more prominent autonomy-related discussions in applied ethics, but other debates in applied ethics–relating, for example, to injunctions against discrimination (Gardner 1992 and Doyle 2007) or against domestic abuse (Friedman 2003), to name a couple–have been approached and adjudicated in reference to the importance of respecting autonomy as well.
More often than not, however, those who reference the principle of respect for autonomy in applied ethics either take its normative force for granted, or only devote passing attention to the question of its justification. Yet, given that the principle is neither self-evident nor immune to challenge, it is very important that those who reference the principle be able to provide a robust justification of its normative weight. Because of its fundamentality, this issue will be considered separately and in more detail in section 4 below.
Autonomy is considered normatively significant for issues in political philosophy, primarily in relation to discussions of social justice and rights. It is particularly important for political liberalism (see, for example, Christman and Anderson 2005); and some have argued that autonomy is the core value of liberalism (see White 1991 and Dagger 2005). Four of the most important issues in political philosophy that invoke the normative significance of autonomy include:
(i) The establishment and validation of just social and political principles
(ii) The legitimation of political power
(iii) The justification of political rights (both specific and general)
(iv) The acceptability of political paternalism
(i) A conception of the autonomous individual provides the perspective from which social and political principles are formulated, and validated as just, in several contractarian political theories. A classic example is provided in Rawls’ A Theory of Justice (1971). According to Rawls, principles of social justice are best conceived and validated based on what would be acceptable to (representatives of) members of society gathering together in an ‘original position’ behind a ‘veil of ignorance’. Rawls argued that the conditions that constrain this process will ensure that those taking part in it are acting autonomously (that is, according to Rawls, as free and rational). Of key importance is the veil of ignorance because, by preventing any detailed knowledge of one’s condition or place in society, it “deprives the persons in the original position of the knowledge that would enable them to choose heteronomous principles”. Rawls concludes: “[W]e can say that by acting from these principles persons are acting autonomously: they are acting from principles that they would acknowledge under conditions that best express their nature as free and equal rational beings.” Given these key constraints in the contracting process, it results, according to Rawls, in valid principles of social justice. Here it can be seen that autonomy has double (and mutually supporting) normative significance: it characterizes members of society in an idealized way in order to form the normatively privileged perspective from which to establish principles of social justice; and it provides the standard that validates those principles as just (viz., by being accepted by autonomous agents). One can see the influence of Kant’s conception of autonomy and its normative significance in this doctrine. Roughly put, Kant held that moral principles are those that would be accepted by persons within an idealized constraint–viz., insofar as they are autonomous. Similarly, Rawls argued that the principles of social justice are those that would be accepted by persons within an idealized constraint–viz., insofar as they are conceived as autonomous (free and rational) agents behind a veil of ignorance in the original position. Rawls explicitly acknowledged his indebtedness to Kant in this regard.
(ii) In relation, a cornerstone of political liberalism is the view that political power is legitimized by its free acceptance by a state’s subjects who are conceived (at least minimally) as autonomous persons. John Locke is recognized as one of the key progenitors of this view of the legitimation of political power. In Two Treatises on Government (1689), he wrote: “Men being, as has been said, by nature all free, equal, and independent, no one can be put out of his estate, and subjected to the political power of another, without his own consent, which is done by agreeing with other men to join and unite into a community for their comfortable, safe, and peaceable living one amongst another…” That which secures the legitimacy of government on such a view is precisely the agreement to do so amongst those who are not only naturally equal in standing, but also free and independent–that is, self-directing. The tradition of placing crucial normative weight on the autonomy of the contracting parties has continued to the present. Referring to liberalism in political philosophy in general, John Christman has written (2005), “Liberal legitimacy…assumes that autonomous citizens can endorse the principles that shape the institutions of political power….In this way, political power is an outgrowth of autonomous personhood and choice.” As before, autonomy is fulfilling two (mutually supporting) roles: it is being used to delimit the normatively privileged perspective from which judgment is authoritative regarding political legitimacy, and it is informing (at least partly) the standard in relation to which that judgment (viz., the acceptance of a political power) is made.
(iii) Autonomy is referenced as a core ground in the justification of political rights in a broadly liberal political framework. It is argued, for example, that a theory of autonomy has to be presupposed to achieve agreement with a theory of rights that in principle is acceptable to all. It is also argued that autonomy is absolutely central in views of rights that enshrine the idea that people have the freedom equally to conceive and enjoy widely different forms of meaningful life. Attracta Ingram (Ingram 1994) provides a clear articulation of the view that autonomy deserves a central place in the defense of a scheme of political rights: “I think that the most compelling answer is that people’s most vital human interest is in living meaningful lives. This interest cannot be secured while they are at risk of slavery, social subordination, repression, persecution, and grinding poverty – conditions that history shows to be the lot of many in societies which do not recognize the value of individual freedom. So it is rational for people to want to develop the mental capacities and social environment necessary to living independent lives. Since what is at stake is the proper distribution of human freedom, we have here matters of justice and rights; the province of political morality.” (112-3) Autonomy is thus said by some to be a–or the–core unifying value in a conception of rights that is liberal (and hence pluralistic) in tenor (see also Richards 1989). In addition, the value of autonomy is referenced to justify particular rights such as the right to free speech (Brison 2000) or the right to privacy (Kupfer 1987).
(iv) Autonomy is referenced by many as the core value that militates against the acceptability of political (and informal) paternalism. According to a widely-accepted conception, an act is paternalistic if it involves direct interference with another’s actions and will for the purpose of advancing (what the interferer takes to be) that person’s own good. Paternalism bypasses the agent’s capacity to be self-directing and ignores the agent’s wishes regarding the way she would like to live her own life; and it is these factors that constitute a violation of the autonomy of the one suffering paternalistic influence. It is commonly held that possession of the capacity for autonomy gives the agent a right and an authority–at least in relation to minimally voluntary, self-regarding choices (all else being equal)–to be self-determining without interference (for a detailed account of paternalism and the defense of the claims of autonomy, see VanDeVeer 1986; see also Mill’s classic argument against paternalism in On Liberty). Supporters of paternalistic doctrines tend to argue that paternalism is justified based either on the highly beneficial consequences of such interference, or on the ground that a policy of paternalism could be hypothetically accepted by autonomous agents when the possible related consequences are severe enough (on the latter see Rawls 1999). It has also been argued that a certain degree of paternalism is unavoidable, but that such paternalism should be constrained by the goal of leading persons to welfare-promoting choices while not threatening freedom of choice (Sunstein and Thaler 2003).
It is worth mentioning in passing that J.S. Mill, who is often referenced as a champion of individual liberty and a firm critic of paternalistic policy, endorsed a strong version of paternalism, but only in relation to “those backward states of society in which the race itself may be considered as in its nonage.” In relation to these, Mill (1971) claimed that “Despotism is a legitimate mode of government in dealing with barbarians, provided the end be their improvement and the means justified by actually effecting that end.” Although these claims of Mill’s would find few supporters today, it is worth adding that the standard that Mill employed to ground the distinction between unjustified and justified paternalism was the presence of a kind of maturity of thought and judgment that is not greatly dissimilar to autonomy: “[A]s soon as mankind have attained the capacity of being guided to their own improvement by conviction or persuasion…compulsion, either in the direct form or in that of pains and penalties for noncompliance, is no longer admissible as a means to their own good, and justifiable only for the security of others.”
Several philosophers have argued that autonomy development is the most important goal (or at least one of the most important goals) of a liberal education. Reasoning in support of this claim usually takes two forms. Firstly, some argue that autonomy should be the primary goal of liberal education because autonomy enhancement is the most important goal of the liberal state, and hence an education in such a state should be an education for autonomy (see White 1991, and compare with Raz 1986, ch. 14). Secondly, some argue that autonomy should be the goal of liberal education because it should be a key goal of any form of education, largely because an education for autonomy is crucial for human well-being across the board.
The latter position has been challenged by communitarians, however, who argue that there is no justification for the claim that autonomy is universally valuable, and who see autonomy as at best a parochial (Western) value (see MacIntyre 1981, White 1991, and Raz 1986). The communitarian argument has been challenged in various ways. It has been directly counter-argued, for example, that autonomy is universally intrinsic to well-being (see Norman 1994 and Ishtiyaque & Cuypers 2008). In addition, the epistemic benefits of autonomy development for forming rational judgments about one’s life have been cited as reason for allowing the state to mandate education for autonomy, even over the protests of more traditionally-minded parents (MacMullen 2007). Although communitarians continue to be suspicious of the claim that autonomy should be a goal of all education, it is widely agreed that education for autonomy is central to an education in a liberal society.
As mentioned above (in section 3a), the idea that autonomy gives rise to demands of respect can take two forms. On the one hand, it is argued that the possession of autonomy or the capacity for it grounds human dignity and the basic moral respect for persons that attends that dignity. On the other hand, it is argued that the fact that a choice or demand is autonomous is reason to give special or added normative uptake to that choice or demand. For clarity, one might refer to the former as the principle of respect for autonomy and the latter as the principle of respect for autonomous choice. The principle of respect for autonomy has already been examined in connection with Kant’s moral philosophy, and it was shown that although this principle has been popular, it is also quite controversial, largely because of problems involving exclusion. The principle of respect for autonomous choice will be examined in the present section. As shown above, this principle plays a key role in a variety of normative debates, especially debates in applied ethics. As has been mentioned, however, the principle is often either invoked without supporting argument or is given thin justification at best. The principle is therefore worthy of further discussion, especially with regard to its normative warrant. What is the warrant for the claim that autonomous choices give rise to special demands of respect? Two views have emerged on this question. Unsurprisingly, these views can be delineated along deontological and consequentialist lines.
Firstly, many philosophers following Kant (often only roughly), contend that autonomous choices deserve special respect because persons, as capable of self-determination, are entitled, all else being equal, to be self-determining without interference. This may be termed the authority view of the justification for the principle of respect for autonomous choice. The authority view is most often allied to the view that respect for autonomy functions primarily as a side-constraint which forbids paternalistically-motivated interference in the self-regarding, minimally voluntary choices of others, even if such interference would be prudentially best for the choosing persons.
Secondly, some philosophers following Mill, contend that autonomous choices deserve special respect because a policy of such respect conduces to desirable prudential consequences, either for the choosing agent, or aggregately. On this view, autonomous choices are not to be respected merely because they are autonomous, or because those making them have a capacity for self-determination, but rather because doing so will lead to the most beneficial prudential results. This more consequentialist view of the normative warrant for the principle of respect for autonomous choice may be termed the benefit view.
Based on the literature, it is quite clear that the authority view is the dominant view in the field, and has been for some time. Many philosophers hold that persons have a right to have their self-determining choices respected even in cases where there is good reason to think that the fulfillment of their autonomous choices would lead to bad prudential results (see Wellman 2003 and Darwall 2006). Against this it may be argued that where the prudential results of respecting a person’s autonomous choice are disastrous enough, interference may be justified, thus opening the door to the salience of consequentialist considerations bearing upon the principle (see Young 1982 and Wellman 2003). It has also been argued that the relation between the fulfillment of at least minimally robust autonomous choice and the resulting expression of authentic selfhood (conceived as highly prudentially significant) suggests that the benefit view deserves to be given closer attention (Piper 2009). Given the great popularity and wide employment of the principle of respect for autonomous choice, it is safe to say that the question of its normative warrant deserves far greater attention than it has thus far received.
James Madison University
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 16, 2010 | Originally published: