Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy


Autism, or the Autistic Spectrum Disorder, is a developmental psychological disorder that begins in the early stages of infancy and affects a child’s ability to develop social skills and engage in social activities. Three current psychological/philosophical theories attempt to explain autism as the result of certain cognitive deficiencies. Each theory takes a different approach to the autistic disorder and theorizes different causes. While no theory is without its difficulties, each different approach to the autistic disorder has played an important role in developing the philosophical understanding of social cognition.

Autism is more prevalent, roughly four times more, in males than females. As a disorder, it only has existed as a recognized clinical entity for sixty years and recent research indicates that it is more widespread in the population than is currently appreciated. Persons with autism show various difficulties in social skills, cognitive processing and other co-occurring behavioral and physical problems. The latter include repetitive movements such as hand-waiving or rocking, self-injurious behavior (in cases of extreme autism) and problems with digestion. Autism has become a nationwide issue with numbers of support groups, websites and research programs. Autism has also become influential in many discussions within philosophical psychology.

Autism has played a strong ancillary role in many debates concerning social cognition, how it develops and its structure. Because persons with autism lack the basic abilities to think about others, understanding autism may give us a window into understanding much or all of social cognition. Analogous to the role lesion studies and other neuropsychological disorders play in our understanding of cognition, brain structure and function and neural organization, autism may provide valuable insight into social cognition. The study of autism, with its specific constellation of behavioral and cognitive deficiencies, may be able to highlight the structure, development and nature of social cognition in general.

This article begins with the clinical definition of autism from the DSM-IV, then discusses the role autism has played in three main theories of cognition: Theory of Mind (hereafter ToM), Simulation Theory and the Executive Control or Metacognitive theory. Finally, there is a brief discussion of the role autism still plays in understanding social cognition.

Table of Contents

  1. The Clinical Properties of Autism
  2. Autism and Theory of Mind
  3. Executive Control/Metacognitive Approaches to Autism
  4. Autism and Simulation Theory
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Clinical Properties of Autism

Persons with autism show severely diminished or abnormal social interaction and communication, as well as a restricted repertoire of activities and interests (DSM-IV, p. 66). These symptoms can be mild, seen in a lack of certain nonverbal behaviors such as eye-to-eye gaze and gestures or any type of social interaction, or a more serious lack of all reciprocal social interaction and other large impairments in language development and language use. The autistic child may lack close social ties or the abilities to act as “friends” normally with other children. They also may prefer to play alone rather than with others.

The DSM-IV provides the following checklist as a guide to diagnosing autism:

A. A total of six (or more) items from (1), (2), and (3), with at least two from (1), and one each from (2) and (3):

  1. qualitative impairment in social interaction, as manifested by two of the following:

    (a) marked impairment in the use of multiple non-verbal behaviors such as eye-to-eye gaze, facial expression, body postures, and gestures to regulate social interaction.(b) failure to develop peer relationships appropriate to developmental level

    (c) A lack of spontaneous seeking to share enjoyment, interests, or achievements with other people (e.g., lack of showing, bringing, or pointing out objects of interest)

    (d) Lack of social reciprocity

  2. qualitative impairments in communication as manifested in at least one of the following:

    (a) delay in, or total lack of, the development of spoken language (not accompanied by an attempt to compensate through alternative modes of communication such as gesture or mime)(b) in individuals with adequate speech, marked impairment in the ability to initiate or sustain a conversation with others

    (c) stereotyped and repetitive use of language or idiosyncratic language

    (d) lack of varied, spontaneous make-believe play or social imitative play appropriate to developmental level

  3. restricted repetitive and stereotyped patterns of behavior, interests, and activities, as manifested by at least one of the following:

    (a) encompassing preoccupation with one or more stereotyped and restricted patterns of interest that is abnormal in either intensity or in focus(b) apparently inflexible adherence to specific, nonfunctional routines or rituals

    (c) stereotyped and repetitive motor mannerisms (e.g., hand or finger flapping or twisting, or complex body movements)

    (d) persistent preoccupation with parts or objects

B. Delays or abnormal functioning in at least one of the following areas, with onset prior to age three years: (1) social interaction, (2) language as used in social communication, or (3) symbolic or imaginative play.

C. The disturbance is not better accounted for by Rett’s disorder or Childhood Disintegrative Disorder.

These guidelines intentionally lack specificity to account for the wide variety of symptoms and severity found in cases of autism. One of the more well-known cases of autism, is that of Temple Grandin, who holds a PhD in animal science and teaches at Colorado State University. Professor Grandin teaches classes and runs her own business. These are not the kinds of accomplishments expected from a person diagnosed with autism. The more stereotypical case is the child who neither communicates with others nor seems to want to leave their solitary world. Autism derives its name from the intense feeling one gets of the “aloneness” of the autistic person. Even a brief survey of the literature on autism would suffice to show that people diagnosed with autism have varying degrees of impairment.

The clinical and diagnostic features of autism are given to give the philosophical reader a more direct understanding of how clinicians often view the disorder. While such issues are not typically germane to philosophical discussions, they are important in understanding the disorder.

2. Autism and Theory of Mind

Autism has played an important role in theories of cognition in philosophical psychology. The first approach with which we will deal is the Theory of Mind [ToM] approach to development and its treatment of autism. The phrase “ToM approach” is used as a general marker for that family of theories that takes our knowledge of other minds to be innate and basic (See Baron Cohen, 1995; Carruthers, 1996; and Botterill & Carruthers, 1999 for related ToM views on development and autism). Further, the ToM approach often holds that ToM cognition is subtended by modules of a sort. The work of Simon Baron-Cohen is seminal and is generally taken to be the locus classicus of these approaches.

The following example with help us to better understand the type of socio-cognitive knowledge many theories of social cognition attempt to explain. Imagine two close friends have just come back from a night of trick-or-treating one Halloween and have commenced surveying the candy they received. Sam, being an aficionado of hard candy, begins to gather all those types of pieces into a pile. Sam’s compatriot Alice, on the other hand, is a connoisseur of chocolate and he is reminded of this when he sees her collecting all the chocolates into a pile. As Sam separates his candies from one another he mentions to Alice that he would be willing to trade his chocolates for her candies.

This interaction depends upon the one person representing to themselves the preferences of another. This is the sort of knowledge that the that ToM studies. Sam knows that Alice likes chocolate. Alice knows that Sam has chocolates and might be willing to trade. As this example shows, understanding and recognizing the preferences, desires and beliefs of others plays an important role in our interactions.

Baron-Cohen (1995) believes that our ability to mindread, or understand the beliefs and desires of others and how they influence subsequent behavior, is the result of four separate modules/mechanisms working together in order to produce beliefs about what others know. The mindreading system is broken down into the following four modules, ID- the Intentionality Detector, EDD- Eye Direction-Detector, SAM- the Shared Attention Mechanism, and the ToMM-Theory of Mind Module/mechanism. Each of these four mechanisms line up, roughly, with properties in the world, which are: volition (desires), perception, shared attention and epistemic states (knowledge and belief).

The first mechanism Baron-Cohen describes is the Intentionality Detector (ID) (Baron-Cohen, 1995, p. 32). The ID is a perceptual device that interprets the motion of objects in terms of primitive volitional mental states like goal and desire. A more general rendering of this sort of interpretation would be “Object wants/desires x.” Humans use this because it makes sense of basic animal behaviors like approach and avoidance. In order to interpret motion in this way, one needs only two conceptual states: want and goal. The ID is activated whenever there is any perceptual input that might be identified as an agent. We also interpret certain stimuli in the modality of touch, sound, and other modalities in an intentional fashion (Baron-Cohen, 1995, p. 36). If we back up into something we may take it to be a person, and thus say “pardon me.” Only after we verify that it is not a person do we look around to make sure no one was watching us talk to no one in particular.

The second device is the Eye Detection Device (EDD) (Baron-Cohen, 1995, p. 38). The EDD works only through the visual sensory mode. It has three functions: detecting the presence of eyes or eyelike devices; computing which direction the eyes are pointing; and inferring that if another organism’s eyes are directed toward a thing, then it sees that thing. It is important on Baron-Cohen’s view that the third function be seen as giving the organism with the EDD the ability to posit mental states about the organism it is viewing. A new mental state, “one of knowing or believing that some other creature may have visual access to” is added to the basic/primitive mental states of the child. The second and third functions of the EDD are important for Baron-Cohen. Baron-Cohen believes that it is highly adaptive to be able to make a judgment about another being’s knowledge, such as when the tiger has prey in its sights (see Baron-Cohen, 1995 pp. 32-36). If one calculates that the tiger has its eyes trained on a friend, and one uses their knowledge that eyes are used to see (extrapolation from self and third function of the EDD), then one should realize that the tiger sees one’s friend and probably will want to attack. This is called a dyadic representation: Agent sees X. The ID and EDD can form dyadic representations that are relations between two objects or people. It resembles the story told about the tiger. With the ID one can interpret the tiger as an agent. If the agent sees ones friend, and eating is a desire of the tiger, then one might realize that my friend is in danger.

The third mechanism we will deal with is the shared attention mechanism, or SAM (Baron-Cohen, 1995 pp. 44-50). The SAM’s sole function is building triadic representations. The triadic representation expresses a relation between object, Self, and agent. The representation is put generally thus: [I-see- (tiger-sees my friend)]. The SAM compares input from the ID and the EDD and forms these triadic representations. Continuing the tiger example, with a slight modification, will help. If one sees the tiger prowling (ID), sees your friend some yards away, and sees that the tiger is in a position to see your friend (EDD), the SAM can now extrapolate that both the tiger and you see your friend. Furthermore, if you know that tigers like to hunt humans, you might then warn your friend of his impending lunch date.

In this scenario the SAM makes available the ID’s inference that the tiger has a goal, which one interprets through experience, to the EDD and then reads the eye direction in terms of the agent’s inferred goals. With this information one might surmise, according to the example, that the tiger would, more than likely, eat your buddy. After reaching this conclusion one may yell to try and warn your friend of her danger. With all of this in place we can see that this use of primitive representations could be very adaptive and helpful in navigating through a world that has agents who act with goal directed activity.

The final mechanism in Baron-Cohen’s architecture is the Theory of Mind Module/Mechanism (ToMM) (Baron-Cohen, 1995 pp. 50-55). The ToMM has a number of distinct functions. The ToMM is a cognitive system that allows the human to posit a wide range of mental states from observed behavior— to employ a theory of mind in parsing the behavior of others. We learn that upon seeing a desired item, ceteris paribus, people will likely try to get that item. We also learn that people can often misrepresent the world and that these false-beliefs might lead to behaviors that are explainable only in terms of this false belief. The ToMM is the one mechanism/module that we can utilize in order to understand and codify what we learn about mental/epistemic states. The ToMM gives us the ability to represent epistemic states. These epistemic states include believing, pretending, and dreaming. The final responsibility of the ToMM is be able to put the various epistemic states together to allow us to understand how these pieces work together in mental life. The ToMM has a grand job according to Baron-Cohen: “It has the dual function of representing the set of epistemic mental states and turning all this mentalistic knowledge into a useful theory” (Baron-Cohen, p. 51).

The ToMM has multiple functions. It first processes representations of propositional attitudes of the form: [Agent-Attitude-“Proposition”]. An example is “Selma believes that it is wintery.” This is a different ability than having a mental representation of, “It is wintery today.” It differs because one’s belief about Selma is a representation of what one takes her to believe about the world. Having these sorts of representations is crucial to the ability to represent epistemic mental states. The ToMM also allows us to infer that a person will attempt to obtain what they desire if they believe that they are likely to succeed.

For many ToM researchers, the problems persons with autism show in a variety of ToM tasks is evidence for the innate basis of our cognitions about other minds. For example, persons with autism do poorly on the false-belief task. Persons with autism typically use less mental state attribution in their speech compared with average functioning persons and IQ matched developmentally delayed children. Persons with autism also fail to recognize surprise based emotions in others (Harris, 1989). However, persons with autism do show preserved cognitive function in areas as diverse as mathematics, music and mnemonic capacities. These preserved cognitive abilities in persons with autism support a dissociation which furthers the case that ToM knowledge is separate, and thus likely etiologically different, from other cognitions.

The ToM approach generally finds socio-cognitive knowledge to be innate and highly structured. It is not without its problems, however. Some argue (Fodor, 1998) that the modularity relied upon as a basis for the explanation is not plausible given the nature of modules. Further, persons with autism show a wide range of socio-cognitive abilities (high and low functioning persons with autism) that seems to be further evidence against the modular nature of social cognition. As a result, some argue that other theories provide better explanations of the autistic disorder.

3. Executive Control/Metacognitive Approaches to Autism

An alternative to the ToM view of knowledge and development is known as the Executive Control or Metacognitive theory. Executive Control Theorists propose that our ability to understand the mental states of others is the result of the development and use of more general cognitive and metacognitive processes such as metarepresentation, the self monitoring cognitive activity and problem solving. Metarepresentation is the ability that our minds have to represent a representation or have beliefs about beliefs. So, on Executive Control theory, to represent to myself a belief state of someone else, i.e. “I believe my friend sees my chocolate is in the bowl,” one does so with the understanding that one is representing the belief state of another. According to the Executive Control view, these highly complex cognitions require certain cognitive resources which develop over time and practice. Furthermore, the ability to represent the mental states of others is not native. The metarepresentation of another’s epistemic state is the result of applying general cognitive strategies and abilities within a specific domain.

On the Executive Control approach the mind is a domain general information processor able to utilize a wide variety of cognitive resources across a number of domains in solving problems. Executive Control models of cognition and cognitive development state that most of our upper level cognitive abilities are subtended by the same basic sets of cognitive resources. Our ability to pretend, to problem solve and anticipate the actions of others based on inferred thoughts we take a person to have all stem from basic general cognitive abilities. We use the same sets of cognitive resources to solve problems in math, the social arena and learning our own phone number. Understanding others’ behaviors in a social setting is particular problem that humans must face. In order to understand this arena, we simply use these other cognitive skills within the social domain.

Executive Control models rely on a traditional psychological division of labor in the mind that separates memory into long-term memory (LTM) and short-term or working memory (STM). We also have certain cognitive abilities such as the development and use of certain problem solving strategies and the ability to metarepresent. In addition to the strategies one uses to solve problems, one must also be able to generate a plan or method of solving problems that one can implement. As such, the mind is generally able to organize and reorganize activities as a person solves a problem. “Executive function is defined as the ability to maintain appropriate behaviors such as planning, impulse control, inhibition of prepotent but relevant responses, set maintenance, organized search, and flexibility of thought and action” (Ozonoff, et al., 1991, p. 1083). For example, since Alice (a teacher) knows that she wants to be home by 3:00 this afternoon, she realizes that she must finish up the writing she’s scheduled for today. She must also meet with students. If she realizes that student meetings tap her energy leaving her unsuitable for writing, she must then plan to write before meetings if she wants to accomplish her goals.

According to the executive control model, in certain problem solving situations we are able to monitor our strategies for result and economy and make changes with these goals in mind. In the above case, Alice might simply schedule meetings on days that she does not intend to write so that she might more effectively write on the other days. We can also monitor our performance in reaching certain goals. If it turns out that the division-of-academic-labor plan is not working, Alice may alter that plan. She might even inhibit the tendency they have to allow other factors of their job to take time away from writing. If she stumbles onto a procedure that works well in getting them “primed” to write, she might adopt its use. There are many tests used to evaluate our executive control abilities, but the problem confronting experimentalists is that it is often hard to develop a task that reliably taps one set of skills or abilities. However, there are some direct tests, one of the more famous of which is the Tower of Hanoi Puzzle, which researchers rely on to test executive abilities.

In the Tower of Hanoi tests, participants follow certain rules in order to accomplish the task of moving the stack of discs from one area to the next. Imagine that you are presented with three poles the rightmost of which has three discs of differing sizes. The goal is then to move the configuration of discs you are presented with, largest disc on the bottom followed by the next smallest on top and then the smallest on top of that, to the leftmost pole. You are told that while you accomplish this task you can only move one disc at a time, you cannot place a larger disc onto a smaller one and that you need to accomplish the move in the fewest possible number of moves possible. As you might imagine, initial solutions usually involve mistakes and a great many more moves than is necessary. Persons with poor executive control (children, patients with certain frontal lobe problems, persons with autism, etc.) typically perform poorly on the Tower of Hanoi task. The reason for these failures is clear, according to the Executive Control theorist.

To perform well on the tower task requires the ability to plan a solution. It also requires remembering all the necessary rules that constrain choice. This task also measures the inhibition of prepotent responses, the first of which is to just start moving the discs over to the leftmost pole. Unfortunately, this is not necessarily the wisest first move. If it is the case that persons with autism typically do poorer on this task, this shows that they have poor executive control abilities. There has been some early research that showed persons with autism to do poorly on executive control tasks (Ozonoff, S., Pennington, B. and Rogers, S., 1991), but recent research is beginning to weaken this conclusion (Ozonoff, S. and Strayer, D., (2001).

Other tests of Executive Control function include a variety of card sorting tasks that require the participant to sort the cards based on color, shape, category, etc. Participants are not told the rule for sorting that will be used during the test. They must figure it out as a result of the response from the experimenter affirming or denying the given response. For example, a set of cards will have animals and artifacts that are colored either red or blue. If the rule the experimenter is using is based on color, the participant, provided there are no conditions preventing the learning of the rule, will figure that the proper rule is “like colored cards with like colored cards.” However, at a certain point during the test, after the participant has shown they are using the proper rule, the rule changes and requires that we sort according to object type (artifact or natural object). In order to succeed, the participant must become aware of this rule change and alter their responses accordingly. This test focuses on strategy, perseverance, and the inhibition of prepotent responses and flexibility of action. As with the Tower of Hanoi puzzle, persons with poor overall executive control do poorly on such tasks. While the abilities tested in the Tower of Hanoi and card sorting tasks are certainly necessary for the development of our understanding of other minds, they do not represent the full complement of skills required for awareness of the thoughts of others. There are still other abilities and skills necessary.

On the Executive Control theory, social knowledge comes from our ability to pretend which allows us to metarepresent. Pretence, for many Executive Control theorists, is critically important to the development of metarepresentation (Jarrold et al., 1993). The skills involved with pretence are exactly the same skills required when we begin to think about other minds. When we engage in pretence we are able to divorce the representation of the object from the object itself: the representation becomes decoupled. This allows children the crucial move that separates representation from the object. Once this ability is practiced, the child then realizes that the representation of the object is different from the object itself. Upon the realization that the mind represents and can have representations about the world that are not tied directly to the world (i.e. pretending the hall runner is a parking lot for cars) they are then able to metarepresent a variety of epistemic states.

In order to self-represent the belief state of another, children must be able to understand that they themselves hold representations of the world. They further understand that others have the same types of relations to the world with their thoughts. Children can then create a metarepresentation of the person who has some sort of perceptual contact with the world and then, based on that metarepresentation, can predict what that person would do in a given situation. For instance, if Sam knows that Alice saw him hide his candy in the box under his bed, then he could suspect that she might go to the hiding spot if she wants some chocolate. Such metarepresentational abilities also allow us to recognize the so-called “false-belief” states of others. Sam must be able to recognize that Alice saw him put the chocolate in the box under his bed, know that he changed the hiding spot unbeknownst to her and realize that she wouldn’t know that the hiding spot had changed since she never saw me move the chocolate. She would have a false-belief based on his particular epistemic relation to the word that he realizes to be inaccurate. Understanding that someone has a false belief also requires that the user have cognitive control over the contents of his mind so that he does not confuse his own beliefs about the world with what they take others to believe. Only after these ancillary abilities are developed can the child succeed in recognizing the false-beliefs of others. Note that these complex chains of thought require a large working memory span that tracks not only my wants (to keep the chocolate for myself), but also the desires and beliefs of another (Alice wants the chocolate and believes it’s where Sam first hid it).

A result of this particular view about cognition, development and our metarepresentational abilities is a markedly different approach and explanation of the disorder autism than we encountered with the ToM approach. Instead of taking the root problem of autism to be due to a failure of some mechanism/module dedicated to the processing of certain social stimuli, the metacognitive approach finds that autism is the result of an inadequate working memory, which allows us to metarepresent (Keenan, 2000). The autistic disorder is the result of a failing of the Executive Control mechanism responsible for inhibiting certain responses, problems in working memory, recall and inflexible and perseverative problem-solving strategies (Ozonoff, et al., 1991). The failure of persons with autism on typical false-belief tasks is the result of being unable to differentiate their own views from another’s during recall (Hughes, 2002). They might also adopt the improper strategy of relying on their own personal beliefs, either by confusing which set of beliefs belongs with whom or simply forgetting which belief is theirs, in answering questions about others’ beliefs. The problem facing persons with autism and causing their suite of behavioral problems is thus a general inability to accurately store and recall information rather than a specific focal deficit in understanding mental states.

4. Autism and Simulation Theory

Simulation Theory (ST) is usually offered in contrast to other approaches and has is supported more by philosophers than psychologists. While ST traditionally received less critical notice than competing approaches, recently a variety of researchers have ardently and eloquently defended it (such as Alvin Goldman, Robert Gordon and Gregory Currie, Paul Harris and Ian Ravenscroft). ST may be more likely to explain socio-cognitive abilities since it is not laden with the theoretical commitments of ToM and utilizes some of the strengths of the executive control theory.

Simulation Theory holds that one’s knowledge of other minds is related to some sort of capacity to imagine or simulate the beliefs, desires and intentions of another and predict what they would do if one were to act in accordance with the simulated propositional attitudes. For Currie and Ravenscroft (2002, p. 52) each person is able to imaginatively project themselves into the place of another person and “generate within ourselves states of imagining that have as their counterparts the beliefs and desires of someone whose behavior we want to predict.” For Goldman (2006) mindreading begins with a basic “like-me” judgment based on low-level face based emotion recognition abilities. Using a basic “like-me” judgment, we can sense how others are feeling by the facial display of another. Seeing someone display the disgust face activates in our brains the same motor neuron paths as are active when we experience disgust. Through the use of special mirror-neurons, the brain is wired to fire those motor pathways it sees in others.

A main point of contention between the “theory”-theorists and the simulation theorists resides in what exactly the “like-me” consists. For the former, the judgment relies on theoretical assumptions, thus vindicating a theoretical component to social cognition; for the latter, it is the result of basic processes, neural or otherwise. The “like-me” judgment is at the heart of Goldman’s (2006) claim that simulation is the basic method through which we understand others. Regardless of what the “like-me” me judgment is or requires, the evidence for neonatal mimicry relies on studies that have proven difficult to replicate.

For both Currie and Ravenscroft (2002) and Goldman (2006) simulative abilities are fueled by a very basic perceptual ability to recognize emotions in others. In order to recognize how others are feeling, the infant must be able to cue into social stimuli. Once the infant can see these cues, they can begin to mimicking certain features of the emotional expression. Once they begin to mimic the expression, they begin to generate the affect states involved in the mimicked display. According to Currie and Ravenscroft, once these feats are accomplished the infant can assume that if the perceived creature is in a state, and the infant knows what that state feels like, whatever they feel is felt by other. The infant makes a very basic “like me” judgment and, from that judgment, an understanding of others begins. As the children begin to track eye-gaze and use proto-declarative pointing, they begin to develop more sophisticated ways of understanding that aids them in understanding and predicting the behavior of others.

There is an important difference in focus between Goldman’s and Currie and Ravnecroft’s versions of ST. For Goldman, prediction of behavior does not require a feeding in of propositional attitudes or mental states into one’s own cognitive system. In understanding another’s mental states, one mirrors those behaviors or facial expressions. In so doing, one comes to an unmediated understanding of how the other feels. For ST theorists like Currie and Ravenscroft, one places the pretend mental states into imagination and then allows the cognitive system run “offline” and generate predictions. This difference is important for theorists like Goldman who base simulation off certain neural functioning like mirroring.

Our ability to predict others’ behavior requires an act imagination to run the simulation. Our imagination provides the mental area in which we can simulate the role beliefs would play in certain inferential practices of an entertained person. If one imagines that another is hungry, then one might believe that they will go get lunch. One does this because when one believes themselves to be hungry they go get lunch. One plugs in supposed beliefs and desires and then runs a simulation as to what these states would cause them to do in that situation. Goldman (2006) allows that something like the above process occurs when we attempt to understand other’s mental states, but he thinks that this is an upper-level cognitive process and should be seen as importantly different from the lower level “like-me” judgment. The former processes require the lower level mirroring tasks.

In order for one to properly predict another’s behavior based on the simulation of another’s thoughts or behavior, certain assumptions must be made. When one simply thinks “What would I do in this situation” in order to allow the proper inferential chain to go through, one must assume that self and the target are roughly equivalent in a number of important respects. If one lacks basic assumptions about others, or for some other reasons believes that the target is different in important respects, one must augment the simulation with this information so as to have accurate predictions of the other’s behavior. One must disregard or replace certain basic assumptions that they might entertain in a normal case. Thus, the type of simulation one must perform becomes more complex.

In a typical case, one would predict that their friend, whom they know is hungry will likely attempt to go get lunch if the opportunity presents itself. One can make this judgment based on the fact that they would do the same thing in the situation. One plugs in the relevant information and runs a simulation. However, if one knows that their friend is on a diet, they have to take that into account when simulating their behavior. One cannot simply run the simulation using their own particular beliefs, as they are not on a diet. Details of this sort are crucial in understanding and predicting behavior.

On Currie and Ravenscroft’s version of ST, autism is the result of an inability to properly use imagination in the problem solving process, specifically, the process of placing ourselves, imaginatively, into the place of another. However, the problem facing persons with autism is not a complete inability to place themselves imaginatively in the situation of another. Rather, it is a difficulty in developing the skills necessary to practice the imaginative replacement.

Placing yourself in someone’s position, as detailed above, requires that you allow certain belief or desire states that you do not have to become active. We must set aside our own “mental economy” and allow the entertained propositional states to guide our beliefs of what that person might do. As with the earlier example of eating when hungry, since one is not on a diet, one must set aside their own responses and think “as if” they were. Thus, one would choose to not eat in the face of the hunger. Part of the difficulty persons with autism face is they are simply unable to make the proper adjustments to their own mental economy to allow the imagined belief states to play the proper role in simulating another’s beliefs. Persons with autism simply find it too difficult to simulate another person’s belief or desire states. Currie and Ravenscroft claim that the reason that persons with autism cannot simulate others is that they were never able to develop those abilities that allow for complex simulations to occur.

The reason persons with autism lack the development and use of ToM abilities is that they lack the “quasi-perceptual capacity for emotion recognition” (Currie and Ravenscroft, 2002 p. 159). They take the ability to recognize emotions to be something that is native or that surfaces early in development. Since persons with autism do not pick up on the basic emotional cues, they lack one of the primary inputs that allow simulation to occur. According to the authors, a young child perceives another’s emotional state, mimics those facial/bodily expressions and, based on how that mimicked facial expression feels to them as they perform it, thereby know what it feels like to be in that state. Since a person with autism does not even cue into these basic emotional states, they are never in a position to make the proper “like-me” reasoning and they never begin the basic mimicry that sets the whole simulative process into motion. The effects of this simple inability to recognize and simulate other’s emotional states are far-reaching.

Thus, autism, for Currie and Ravenscroft (2002), is an imaginative disorder. There are Executive Control problems like those mentioned in Executive Control models, but these problems come after and as a result of the inability to pick up on the basic perceptual content that cues us in to the mental states of others.

For a simulation theorist like Goldman (2006) the root of the autistic disorder is to be found in basic mirror-neuron dysfunction. Goldman bases his view off studies that show persons with autism are less apt in imitative abilities than average persons. Goldman cites further evidence that seems to indicate that the mirror neurons that allow simulation to occur are not functioning (Goldman, 2006 p. 206). The evidence for the mirror neuron dysfunction is tentative and Goldman notes this. But ST theorists find that the recent research into mirror neuron function and the role that these neurons play in a host of social behaviors such as mimicry, and thinking about others thoughts and actions are important signs that the theory is more supported than the rival “theory”-theory approach.

5. Conclusion

Autism remains an intriguing disorder that is only partially understood. No theory can claim to be the most widely accepted and each has its own difficulties. “Theory”-theory needs to find ways to deal with much of the new research on where and how certain tasks are performed in the brain. Some of this research, as Goldman (2006) notes, seems to violate the modularity basis that “theory”-theory requires. Further, the “theory”-theorists’ like Baron-Cohen have retreated from their theoretical commitments and offered alternative views of the autistic disorder (Baron-Cohen, 2002). Simulation theory and Executive Control theory often rely on the claim that the executive control abilities are dysfunctional in persons with autism and some recent research calls this into question (Ozonoff, S., and Strayer, D., 2001; Hughes, C., 2002).

Some recent research has tried to blend together the theoretical tenets of all of the approaches (Cundall, 2006; Keenan, 2000) forming a hybrid version of the theories and often a détente between “theory”-theory and simulation theory can be found. Researchers like Goldman think theoretical reasoning about other’s mental states is likely, but not the basic form of socio-cognitive thought. “Theory”-theorists often note that something like simulation is used, but it is only a later developmental ability in social cognition. Other researchers, Rittscher, et al, (2003) are avoiding some of the more theoretical disputes and have simply begun to investigate how socio-cognitive information is processed in the brain. Autism still presents any researcher interested in explaining socio-cognitive development an interesting challenge and any theory that purports to explain socio-cognitive structure and development will need to offer an explanation of the disorder.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Barkow, J., Cosmides, L., Tooby, J. (1992). The Adapted Mind. New York. Oxford University Press.
  • Baron-Cohen, S., (1995). Mindblindness. Cambridge, Mass: The MIT Press.
  • Baron-Cohen, S., (2003). The Essential Difference. New York: Basic Books.
  • Bechtel, W., and Richardson, R. (1992). Discovering Complexity. Princeton, NJ. Princeton University Press.
  • Bickle, J., (2003). Philosophy and Neurosciences: A Ruthlessly Reductive Account. Dordrecht-The Netherlands: Kluwer Academic Publishers
  • Blake, R., Turner, L., Smoski, M, Pozdol, S., and Stone, W. (2003). Visual Recognition of Biological Motion is Impaired in children with Autism. Psychological Science, Vol. 14, 151-158.
  • Bloom, P., and German, T. (2000). Two reasons to abandon the false-belief task as a test of theory of mind. Cognition, 77: B25-B31.
  • Botterill, G., and Carruthers, P. (1999). Philosophy of Psychology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Carruthers, P., (2003). Review of Currie and Ravenscroft’s Recreative Minds. Retrieved October 25, 2004.
  • Carruthers, P., and Smith, P. (1996). Theories of Theories of Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Castelloe, P., and Dawson, G. (1993). Subclassification of Children with Autism and Pervasive Developmental Disorders. A Questionnaire bases on the Wing and Gould Subgrouping Scheme. Journal of Autism and Developmental Disorders. Vol. 33: 229-241.
  • Ceponiene, R., Lepisto, T., Shestakova, A., Vanhala, R., Alku, P., Naatanen, R. and Yaguchi, K. (2003). Speech-sound-selective auditory impairment in children with autism: They can perceive but do not attend. Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences. Vol. 100: 5567-5572.
  • Cundall, M., (2006). Autism’s Role in Understanding Social Cognition. Journal of Humanities & Social Sciences, Vol. 1, 1.
  • Currie, G., and Ravenscroft, I., (2002). Recreative Minds. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Currie, G., and Sterelny, K. (2000). How to Think about the Modularity of Mindreading. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 50: 145-162.
  • Dawson, G., Klinger, L., Panagiotides, H., Lewy, A., and Castelloe, P. (1995). Subgroups of Autistic Children Based on Social Behavior Display Distinct Patterns of Brain Activity. Journal of Abnormal Child Psychology. Vol. 23: 569-583.
  • Fodor, J., (1980). Special Sciences, or the Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis. In Readings in the Philosophy of Psychology Vol. I. Ned Block Ed. Cambridge, MA. Harvard Publishers.
  • Fodor, J., (2000). The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way. Cambridge, Mass: The MIT Press.
  • Gerrans, P., (2002). The Theory of Mind Module in Evolutionary Psychology. Biology and Philosophy. Vol. 17: 305-321.
  • Goldman, A., (2006). Simulating Minds. New York. Oxford University Press.
  • Gopnik, A., and Meltzoff, A., (1998). Words, Thoughts and Theories. Cambridge, Mass: The MIT Press.
  • Harris, P. (1989). Children and Emotion. Malden, MA. Blackwell Publishers.
  • Hughes, C. (2002). Executive Functions and Development: Emerging Themes. Infant and Child Development. Vol 11: 201-209.
  • Jarrold, C., Boucher, J., and Smith, P. (1993). Symbolic Play in Autism: a review. Journal of Autism and Developmental Disorders, 23: 281-387.
  • Jarrold, C., Boucher, J., and Smith, P. (1994). Executive Function Deficits and the Pretend Play of Children with Autism. Journal of Child Psychology and Psychiatry. Vol. 35: 1473-1482.
  • Karmiloff-Smith, Annette, (1992). Beyond Modularity. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Keenan, T., (2000). Mind, Memory, and Metacognition. In Minds in the Making: Essays in Honor of David R. Olson. Astington Eds. Malden MA, Blackwell Publishers.
  • Leekam, S., and Prior, M., (1994). Can Autistic Children Distinguish Lies form Jokes? A Second Look at Second Order Belief Attribution. Journal of Child Psychology and Psychiatry. Vol. 35: 901-915.
  • Leslie, A. M. (1992). Autism and the ‘theory of mind’ module. Current Directions in Psychological Science, 1: 18-21.
  • Malle, B., Moses, L., and Baldwin, D. (2001). Intentions and Intentionality: Foundations of Social Cognition. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Olson, D., (1993). The Development of mental representations: the origins of mental life. Canadian Psychology, 30, 293-306.
  • Ozonoff, S., Pennington, B., and Rogers, S. (1991). Executive Function Deficits in High Functioning Autistic Individuals: Relationship to Theory of Mind. Journal of Child Psychology and Psychiatry, 32: 1081-1105.
  • Ozonoff, S., and Strayer, D. (2001). Further Evidence of Intact Working Memory in Autism. Journal of Autism and Developmental Disorders, Vol. 31: 257-263.
  • Pierce, K., Muller, R., Ambrose, J., Allen, G., and Courchesne, E. (2001). Face processing occurs outside the fusiform ‘face area’ in autists: evidence from functional MRI. Brain, 124: 2059-73.
  • Puce, A., and Perrett, D., (2003). Electrophysiology and brain imaging of biological motion. An article in, Decoding, imitating and influencing the actions of others: the mechanisms of social interaction. Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society, 358: 435-445.
  • Provine, R., (2000). Laughter: A Scientific Investigation. New York, Penguin Publishers.
  • Rittscher, J., Blake, A., Hoogs, A., Stein, G., (2003). Mathematical modeling of animate and intentional motion. An article in, Decoding, imitating and influencing the actions of others: the mechanisms of social interaction. Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society, 358: 475-490.
  • Ruffman, T., (2000). Nonverbal Theory of Mind. In Minds in the Making: Essays in Honor of David R. Olson. Astington Eds. Malden MA, Blackwell Publishers.
  • Schultz, R. T., Gauthier, I., Klin, A., Fulbright, R., Anderson, A.W., Volkmar, F., Skudlarski, P., Lacadie, C., Cohen, D. J., and Gore, J. C. (2000) Abnormal ventral temporal cortical activity among individuals with autism and Asperger syndrome during face recognition. Archives of General Psychiatry, 37: 331-340.
  • Sterelny, K., (2003). Thought in a Hostile World: The Evolution of Human Cognition. Malden, MA: Blackwell Pubishers.
  • Volkmar, F., Klin, A., Schultz, R., Chawarska, K., and Jones, W. (2003). The Social Brain in Autism. The Social Brain: Evolution and Pathology. in (Brune, Ribbert and Scheiefenhovel Eds.). Hoboken, NJ. Wiley and Sons Ltd.
  • Wellman, H. M. (1991). The Child’s Theory of Mind. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.

Author Information

Michael Cundall
Arkansas State University
U. S. A.

Last updated: May 19, 2008 | Originally published: