Abu ‘Ali al-Husayn ibn Sina is better known in Europe by the Latinized name “Avicenna.” He is probably the most significant philosopher in the Islamic tradition and arguably the most influential philosopher of the pre-modern era. Born in Afshana near Bukhara in Central Asia in about 980, he is best known as a polymath, as a physician whose major work the Canon (al-Qanun fi’l-Tibb) continued to be taught as a medical textbook in Europe and in the Islamic world until the early modern period, and as a philosopher whose major summa the Cure (al-Shifa’) had a decisive impact upon European scholasticism and especially upon Thomas Aquinas (d. 1274). Primarily a metaphysical philosopher of being who was concerned with understanding the self’s existence in this world in relation to its contingency, Ibn Sina’s philosophy is an attempt to construct a coherent and comprehensive system that accords with the religious exigencies of Muslim culture. As such, he may be considered to be the first major Islamic philosopher. The philosophical space that he articulates for God as the Necessary Existence lays the foundation for his theories of the soul, intellect and cosmos. Furthermore, he articulated a development in the philosophical enterprise in classical Islam away from the apologetic concerns for establishing the relationship between religion and philosophy towards an attempt to make philosophical sense of key religious doctrines and even analyse and interpret the Qur’an. Recent studies have attempted to locate him within the Aristotelian and Neoplatonic traditions. His relationship with the latter is ambivalent: although accepting some keys aspects such as an emanationist cosmology, he rejected Neoplatonic epistemology and the theory of the pre-existent soul. However, his metaphysics owes much to the “Amonnian” synthesis of the later commentators on Aristotle and discussions in legal theory and kalam on meaning, signification and being. Apart from philosophy, Avicenna’s other contributions lie in the fields of medicine, the natural sciences, musical theory, and mathematics. In the Islamic sciences (‘ulum), he wrote a series of short commentaries on selected Qur’anic verses and chapters that reveal a trained philosopher’s hermeneutical method and attempt to come to terms with revelation. He also wrote some literary allegories about whose philosophical value recent scholarship is vehemently at odds.
His influence in medieval Europe spread through the translations of his works first undertaken in Spain. In the Islamic world, his impact was immediate and led to what Michot has called “la pandémie avicennienne.” When al-Ghazali led the theological attack upon the heresies of the philosophers, he singled out Avicenna, and a generation later when the Shahrastani gave an account of the doctrines of the philosophers of Islam, he relied upon the work of Avicenna, whose metaphysics he later attempted to refute in his Struggling against the Philosophers (Musari‘at al-falasifa). Avicennan metaphysics became the foundation for discussions of Islamic philosophy and philosophical theology. In the early modern period in Iran, his metaphysical positions began to be displayed by a creative modification that they underwent due to the thinkers of the school of Isfahan, in particular Mulla Sadra (d. 1641).
Sources on his life range from his autobiography, written at the behest of his disciple ‘Abd al-Wahid Juzjani, his private correspondence, including the collection of philosophical epistles exchanged with his disciples and known as al-Mubahathat (The Discussions), to legends and doxographical views embedded in the ‘histories of philosophy’ of medieval Islam such as Ibn al-Qifti’s Ta’rikh al-hukama (History of the Philosophers) and Zahir al-Din Bayhaqi’s Tatimmat Siwan al-hikma. However, much of this material ought to be carefully examined and critically evaluated. Gutas has argued that the autobiography is a literary device to represent Avicenna as a philosopher who acquired knowledge of all the philosophical sciences through study and intuition (al-hads), a cornerstone of his epistemological theory. Thus the autobiography is an attempt to demonstrate that humans can achieve the highest knowledge through intuition. The text is a key to understanding Avicenna’s view of philosophy: we are told that he only understood the purpose of Aristotle’s Metaphysics after reading al-Farabi’s short treatise on it, and that often when he failed to understand a problem or solve the syllogism, he would resort to prayer in the mosque (and drinking wine at times) to receive the inspiration to understand – the doctrine of intuition. We will return to his epistemology later but first what can we say about his life?
Avicenna was born in around 980 in Afshana, a village near Bukhara in Transoxiana. His father, who may have been Ismaili, was a local Samanid governor. At an early age, his family moved to Bukhara where he studied Hanafi jurisprudence (fiqh) with Isma‘il Zahid (d. 1012) and medicine with a number of teachers. This training and the excellent library of the physicians at the Samanid court assisted Avicenna in his philosophical self-education. Thus, he claimed to have mastered all the sciences by the age of 18 and entered into the service of the Samanid court of Nuh ibn Mansur (r. 976-997) as a physician. After the death of his father, it seems that he was also given an administrative post. Around the turn of the millennium, he moved to Gurganj in Khwarazm, partly no doubt to the eclipse of Samanid rule after the Qarakhanids took Bukhara in 999. He then left again ‘through necessity’ in 1012 for Jurjan in Khurasan to the south in search no doubt for a patron. There he first met his disciple and scribe Juzjani. After a year, he entered Buyid service as a physician, first with Majd al-Dawla in Rayy and then in 1015 in Hamadan where he became vizier of Shams al-Dawla. After the death of the later in 1021, he once again sought a patron and became the vizier of the Kakuyid ‘Ala’ al-Dawla for whom he wrote an important Persian summa of philosophy, the Danishnama-yi ‘Ala’i (The Book of Knowledge for ‘Ala’ al-Dawla). Based in Isfahan, he was widely recognized as a philosopher and physician and often accompanied his patron on campaign. It was during one of these to Hamadan in 1037 that he died of colic. An arrogant thinker who did not suffer fools, he was fond of his slave-girls and wine, facts which were ammunition for his later detractors.
Avicenna wrote his two earliest works in Bukhara under the influence of al-Farabi. The first, a Compendium on the Soul (Maqala fi’l-nafs), is a short treatise dedicated to the Samanid ruler that establishes the incorporeality of the rational soul or intellect without resorting to Neoplatonic insistence upon its pre-existence. The second is his first major work on metaphysics, Philosophy for the Prosodist (al-Hikma al-‘Arudiya) penned for a local scholar and his first systematic attempt at Aristotelian philosophy.
He later wrote three ‘encyclopaedias’encyclopedias of philosophy. The first of these is al-Shifa’ (The Cure), a work modelled on the corpus of the philosopher, namely. Aristotle, that covers the natural sciences, logic, mathematics, metaphysics and theology. It was this work that through its Latin translation had a considerable impact on scholasticism. It was solicited by Juzjani and his other students in Hamadan in 1016 and although he lost parts of it on a military campaign, he completed it in Isfahan by 1027. The other two encyclopaedias were written later for his patron the Buyid prince ‘Ala’ al-Dawla in Isfahan. The first, in Persian rather than Arabic is entitled Danishnama-yi ‘Ala’i (The Book of Knowledge for ‘Ala’ al-Dawla) and is an introductory text designed for the layman. It closely follows his own Arabic epitome of The Cure, namely al-Najat (The Salvation). The Book of Knowledge was the basis of al-Ghazali’s later Arabic work Maqasid al-falasifa (Goals of the Philosophers). The second, whose dating and interpretation have inspired debates for centuries, is al-Isharat wa’l-Tanbihat (Pointers and Reminders), a work that does not present completed proofs for arguments and reflects his mature thinking on a variety of logical and metaphysical issues. According to Gutas it was written in Isfahan in the early 1030s; according to Michot, it dates from an earlier period in Hamadan and possibly Rayy. A further work entitled al-Insaf (The Judgement) which purports to represent a philosophical position that is radical and transcends AristotelianisingAristotle’s Neoplatonism is unfortunately not extant, and debates about its contents are rather like the arguments that one encounters concerning Plato’s esoteric or unwritten doctrines. One further work that has inspired much debate is The Easterners (al-Mashriqiyun) or The Eastern Philosophy (al-Hikma al-Mashriqiya) which he wrote at the end of the 1020s and is mostly lost.
Avicenna’s major work, The Cure, was translated into Latin in 12th and 13th century Spain (Toledo and Burgos) and, although it was controversial, it had an important impact and raised controversies inin medieval scholastic philosophy. In certain cases the Latin manuscripts of the text predate the extant Arabic ones and ought to be considered more authoritative. The main significance of the Latin corpus lies in the interpretation for Avicennism andAvicennism, in particular forregarding his doctrines on the nature of the soul and his famous existence-essence distinction (more about that below) andbelow), along with the debates and censure that they raised in scholastic Europe, in particular in ParisEurope. This was particularly the case in Paris, where Avicennism waslater proscribed in 1210. However, the influence of his psychology and theory of knowledge upon William of Auvergne and Albertus Magnus have been noted. More significant is the impact of his metaphysics upon the work and thought of Thomas Aquinas. His other major work to be translated into Latin was his medical treatise the Canon, which remained a text-book into the early modern period and was studied in centrescenters of medical learning such as Padua.
Logic is a critical aspect of, and propaedeutic to, Avicennan philosophy. His logical works follow the curriculum of late Neoplatonism and comprise nine books, beginning with his version of Porphyry’s Isagoge followed by his understanding and modification of the Aristotelian Organon, which included the Poetics and the Rhetoric. On the age-old debate whether logic is an instrument of philosophy (Peripatetic view) or a part of philosophy (Stoic view), he argues that such a debate is futile and meaningless.
His views on logic represent a significant metaphysical approach, and it could be argued generally that metaphysical concerns lead Avicenna’s arguments in a range of philosophical and non-philosophical subjects. For example, he argues in The Cure that both logic and metaphysics share a concern with the study of secondary intelligibles (ma‘qulat thaniya), abstract concepts such as existence and time that are derived from primary concepts such as humanity and animality. Logic is the standard by which concepts—or the mental “existence” that corresponds to things that occur in extra-mental reality—can be judged and hence has both implications for what exists outside of the mind and how one may articulate those concepts through language. More importantly, logic is a key instrument and standard for judging the validity of arguments and hence acquiring knowledge. Salvation depends on the purity of the soul and in particular the intellect that is trained and perfected through knowledge. Of particular significance for later debates and refutations is his notion that knowledge depends on the inquiry of essential definitions (hadd) through syllogistic reasoning. The problem of course arises when one tries to make sense of an essential definition in a real, particular world, and when one’s attempts to complete the syllogism by striking on the middle term is foiled because one’s ‘intuition’ fails to grasp the middle term.
From al-Farabi, Avicenna inherited the Neoplatonic emanationist scheme of existence. Contrary to the classical Muslim theologians, he rejected creation ex nihilo and argued that cosmos has no beginning but is a natural logical product of the divine One. The super-abundant, pure Good that is the One cannot fail to produce an ordered and good cosmos that does not succeed him in time. The cosmos succeeds God merely in logical order and in existence.
Consequently, Avicenna is well known as the author of one an important and influential proof for the existence of God. This proof is a good example of a philosopher’s intellect being deployed for a theological purpose, as was common in medieval philosophy. The argument runs as follows: There is existence, or rather our phenomenal experience of the world confirms that things exist, and that their existence is non-necessary because we notice that things come into existence and pass out of it. Contingent existence cannot arise unless it is made necessary by a cause. A causal chain in reality must culminate in one un-caused cause because one cannot posit an actual infinite regress of causes (a basic axiom of Aristotelian science). Therefore, the chain of contingent existents must culminate in and find its causal principle in a sole, self-subsistent existent that is Necessary. This, of course, is the same as the God of religion.
An important corollary of this argument is Avicenna’s famous distinction between existence and essence in contingents, between the fact that something exists and what it is. It is a distinction that is arguably latent in Aristotle although the roots of Avicenna’s doctrine are best understood in classical Islamic theology or kalam. Avicenna’s theory of essence posits three modalities: essences can exist in the external world associated with qualities and features particular to that reality; they can exist in the mind as concepts associated with qualities in mental existence; and they can exist in themselves devoid of any mode of existence. This final mode of essence is quite distinct from existence. Essences are thus existentially neutral in themselves. Existents in this world exist as something, whether human, animal or inanimate object; they are ‘dressed’ in the form of some essence that is a bundle of properties that describes them as composites. God on the other hand is absolutely simple, and cannot be divided into a bundle of distinct ontological properties that would violate his unity. Contingents, as a mark of their contingency, are conceptual and ontological composites both at the first level of existence and essence and at the second level of properties. Contingent things in this world come to be as mentally distinct composites of existence and essence bestowed by the Necessary.
This proof from contingency is also sometimes termed “radical contingency.” Later arguments raged concerning whether the distinction was mental or real, whether the proof is ontological or cosmological. The clearest problem with Avicenna’s proofs lies in the famous Kantian objection to ontological arguments: is existence meaningful in itself? Further, Cantor’s solution to the problem of infinity may also be seen as a setback to the argument from the impossibility of actual infinites.
Avicenna’s metaphysics is generally expressed in Aristotelian terms. The quest to understand being qua being subsumes the philosophical notion of God. Indeed, as we have seen divine existence is a cornerstone of his metaphysics. Divine existence bestows existence and hence meaning and value upon all that exists. Two questions that were current were resolved through his theory of existence. First, theologians such as al-Ash‘ari and his followers were adamant in denying the possibility of secondary causality; for them, God was the sole agent and actor in all that unfolded. Avicenna’s metaphysics, although being highly deterministic because of his view of radical contingency, still insists of the importance of human and other secondary causality. Second, the age-old problem was discussed: if God is good, how can evil exist? Divine providence ensures that the world is the best of all possible worlds, arranged in the rational order that one would expect of a creator akin to the demiurge of the Timaeus. But while this does not deny the existence of evil in this world of generation and corruption, some universal evil does not exist because of the famous Neoplatonic definition of evil as the absence of good. Particular evils in this world are accidental consequences of good. Although this deals with the problem of natural evils, the problem of moral evils and particularly ‘horrendous’ evils remains.
The second most influential idea of Avicenna is his theory of the knowledge. The human intellect at birth is rather like a tabula rasa, a pure potentiality that is actualized through education and comes to know. Knowledge is attained through empirical familiarity with objects in this world from which one abstracts universal concepts. It is developed through a syllogistic method of reasoning; observations lead to prepositional statements, which when compounded lead to further abstract concepts. The intellect itself possesses levels of development from the material intellect (al-‘aql al-hayulani), that potentiality that can acquire knowledge to the active intellect (al-‘aql al-fa‘il), the state of the human intellect at conjunction with the perfect source of knowledge.
But the question arises: how can we verify if a proposition is true? How do we know that an experience of ours is veridical? There are two methods to achieve this. First, there are the standards of formal inference of arguments —Is the argument logically sound? Second, and most importantly, there is a transcendent intellect in which all the essences of things and all knowledge resides. This intellect, known as the Active Intellect, illuminates the human intellect through conjunction and bestows upon the human intellect true knowledge of things. Conjunction, however, is episodic and only occurs to human intellects that have become adequately trained and thereby actualized. The active intellect also intervenes in the assessment of sound inferences through Avicenna’s theory of intuition. A syllogistic inference draws a conclusion from two prepositional premises through their connection or their middle term. It is sometimes rather difficult to see what the middle term is; thus when someone reflecting upon an inferential problem suddenly hits upon the middle term, and thus understands the correct result, she has been helped through intuition (hads) inspired by the active intellect. There are various objections that can be raised against this theory, especially because it is predicated upon a cosmology widely refuted in the post-Copernican world.
One of the most problematic implications of Avicennan epistemology relates to God’s knowledge. The divine is pure, simple and immaterial and hence cannot have a direct epistemic relation with the particular thing to be known. Thus Avicenna concluded while God knows what unfolds in this world, he knows things in a ‘universal manner’ through the universal qualities of things. God only knows kinds of existents and not individuals. This resulted in the famous condemnation by al-Ghazali who said that Avicenna’s theory amounts to a heretical denial of God’s knowledge of particulars. particulars.
Avicenna’s epistemology is predicated upon a theory of soul that is independent of the body and capable of abstraction. This proof for the self in many ways prefigures by 600 years the Cartesian cogito and the modern philosophical notion of the self. It demonstrates the Aristotelian base and Neoplatonic structure of his psychology. This is the so-called ‘flying man’ argument or thought experiment found at the beginning of his Fi’-Nafs/De Anima (Treatise on the Soul). If a person were created in a perfect state, but blind and suspended in the air but unable to perceive anything through his senses, would he be able to affirm the existence of his self? Suspended in such a state, he cannot affirm the existence of his body because he is not empirically aware of it, thus the argument may be seen as affirming the independence of the soul from the body, a form of dualism. But in that state he cannot doubt that his self exists because there is a subject that is thinking, thus the argument can be seen as an affirmation of the self-awareness of the soul and its substantiality. This argument does raise an objection, which may also be levelled at Descartes: how do we know that the knowing subject is the self?
This rational self possesses faculties or senses in a theory that begins with Aristotle and develops through Neoplatonism. The first sense is common sense (al-hiss al-mushtarak) which fuses information from the physical senses into an epistemic object. The second sense is imagination (al-khayal) which processes the image of the perceived epistemic object. The third sense is the imaginative faculty (al-mutakhayyila) which combines images in memory, separates them and produces new images. The fourth sense is estimation or prehension (wahm) that translates the perceived image into its significance. The classic example for this innovative sense is that of the sheep perceiving the wolf and understanding the implicit danger. The final sense is where the ideas produced are stored and analyzed and ascribed meanings based upon the production of the imaginative faculty and estimation. Different faculties do not compromise the singular integrity of the rational soul. They merely provide an explanation for the process of intellection.
Was Avicenna a mystic? Some of his interpreters in Iran have answered in the positive, citing the lost work The Easterners that on the face of it has a superficial similarity to the notion of Ishraqi or Illuminationist, intuitive philosophy expounded by Suhrawardi (d. 1191) and the final section of Pointers that deal with the terminology of mysticism and Sufism. The question does not directly impinge on his philosophy so much since The Easterners is mostly non-extant. But it is an argument relating to ideology and the ways in which modern commentators and scholars wish to study Islamic philosophy as a purely rational form of inquiry or as a supra-rational method of understanding reality. Gutas has been most vehement in his denial of any mysticism in Avicenna. For him, Avicennism is rooted in the rationalism of the Aristotelian tradition. Intuition does not entail mystical disclosure but is a mental act of conjunction with the active intellect. The notion of intuition is located itself by Gutas in Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics 89b10-11. While some of the mystical commentators of Avicenna have relied upon his pseudo-epigraphy (such as some sort of Persian Sufi treatises and the Mi‘rajnama), one ought not to throw the baby out with the bath water. The last sections of Pointers are significant evidence of Avicenna’s acceptance of some key epistemological possibilities that are present in mystical knowledge such as the possibility of non-discursive reason and simple knowledge. Although one can categorically deny that he was a Sufi (and indeed in his time the institutions of Sufism were not as established as they were a century later) and even raise questions about his adherence to some form of mysticism, it would be foolish to deny that he flirts with the possibilities of mystical knowledge in some of his later authentic works.
Avicenna’s major achievement was to propound a philosophically defensive system rooted in the theological fact of Islam, and its success can be gauged by the recourse to Avicennan ideas found in the subsequent history of philosophical theology in Islam. In the Latin West, his metaphysics and theory of the soul had a profound influence on scholastic arguments, and as in the Islamic East, was the basis for considerable debate and argument. Just two generations after him, al-Ghazali (d. 1111) and al-Shahrastani (d. 1153) in their attacks testify to the fact that no serious Muslim thinker could ignore him. They regarded Avicenna as the principal representative of philosophy in Islam. In the later Iranian tradition, Avicenna’s thought was critically distilled with mystical insight, and he became known as a mystical thinker, a view much disputed in more recent scholarship. Nevertheless the major works of Avicenna, The Cure and Pointers, became the basis for the philosophical curriculum in the madrasa. Numerous commentaries, glosses and super-glosses were composed on them and continued to be produced into the 20th century. While our current views on cosmology, the nature of the self, and knowledge raise distinct problems for Avicennan ideas, they do not address the important issue of why his thought remained so influential for such a long period of time. In In recent times, Avicenna has been attacked by some contemporary Arab Muslim thinkers in search of a new rationalism within Arab culture, one that champions Averroes against Avicenna.
Sajjad H. Rizvi
University of Bristol
Last updated: January 6, 2006 | Originally published: