Madhyamaka and Yogācāra are the two main philosophical trajectories associated with the Mahāyāna stream of Buddhist thought. According to Tibetan doxographical literature, Madhyamaka represents the philosophically definitive expression of Buddhist doctrine. Stemming from the second-century writings of Nāgārjuna, Madhyamaka developed in the form of commentaries on his works. This style of development is characteristic of the basically scholastic character of the Indian philosophical tradition. The commentaries elaborated not only varying interpretations of Nāgārjuna’s philosophy but also different understandings of the philosophical tools that are appropriate to its advancement. Tibetan interpreters generally claim to take the seventh-century commentaries of Candrakīrti as authoritative, but Indian commentators subsequent to him were in fact more influential in the course of Indian philosophy. Madhyamaka also had considerable influence (though by way of a rather different set of texts) in East Asian Buddhism, where a characteristic interpretive concern has been to harmonize Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. Although perhaps most frequently characterized by modern interpreters as a Buddhist version of skepticism, Madhyamaka arguably develops metaphysical concerns. The logically elusive character of Madhyamaka arguments has fascinated and perplexed generations of scholars. This is surely appropriate with regard to a school whose principal term of art, “emptiness” (śūnyatā), reflects developments in Buddhist thought from the high scholasticism of Tibet to the enigmatic discourse of East Asian Zen.
“Madhyamaka” is a Sanskrit word that simply means “middle way.” (The derivative form “Mādhyamika” literally means “of or relating to the middle,” and conventionally designates an adherent of the school, or qualifies some aspect of its thought.) Madhyamaka refers to the Indian Buddhist school of thought that develops in the form of commentaries on the works of Nāgārjuna, who flourished around 150 C.E. Nāgārjuna figures in the traditional accounts developed to authenticate the literature of the self-styled “Mahāyāna” stream of Buddhist thought. Arguing that sūtras known to have begun circulating only at the beginning of the first millennium could nevertheless represent the authentic teaching of the Buddha (buddhavacana), proponents of Mahāyāna invoked the characteristically Buddhist idea of “skill in means” (upāyakauśalya); they thus claimed that the Mahāyāna sūtras promulgate an advanced stage of the Buddha’s teaching such as would not have been appropriately taught to the earliest auditors of the Buddha, who, unprepared by the necessarily preparatory earlier teachings, might draw nihilistic conclusions from the sūtras. It is Nāgārjuna who is said first to have recovered and promulgated these sūtras, having retrieved the Prajñāpāramitā (“Perfection of Wisdom”) literature from the underwater kingdom of the “Nāgas,” or serpent kings.
Two texts generally represent the criteria for attributing authorship of a text to Nāgārjuna. So, this name conventionally refers to the person who wrote the Mūlamadhyamakakārikās (MMK, “Verses on the Firmly Fixed Middle Way”) and the Vigrahavyāvartanī (VV, “Turning Back Objections”). Both of these texts, but particularly the former, have occasioned a great deal of interest among Indologists and philosophers. This is not surprising, since the MMK is indeed a rich text. Stylistically lucid yet logically enigmatic, Nāgārjuna’s major work shares with the Prajñāpāramitā literature a characteristic air of paradox, which Madhyamaka’s critics see as evidence of nihilism if not of incoherence. We read in this text, for example, that “there is, on the part of saṃsāra, no difference at all from nirvāṇa” (MMK 25.19). The text’s first verse says “There do not exist, anywhere at all, any existents whatsoever, arisen either from themselves or from something else, either from both or altogether without cause.” (MMK 1.1)
In styling the school that develops from Nāgārjuna’s works the “middle way” (an expression used by Nāgārjuna himself), proponents of Madhyamaka exploited a long-invoked Buddhist trope. Traditional accounts of the life of the Buddha typically characterize him as striking a “middle way” between the extravagance of the courtly life that had been available to him as a prince and the extreme asceticism he is said initially to have tried in his pursuit of transformative insight. Philosophically, the relevant extremes between which any Buddhist account of the person must steer are “eternalism” and “nihilism.” Eternalism (śāśvatavāda) is the view that there are enduring existents of which the self is an example. Nihilism (ucchedavāda) might be termed “eliminativism,” and denotes, for Buddhists, the view that actions (karma) have no ethical consequences, insofar as the agents of actions cannot be said to endure as the subjects who will experience their effects.
Given their characteristically Buddhist concern to refuse the existence of an ultimately existent “self,” it is the nihilism pole that Mādhyamikas must work hardest to avoid. Indeed, the concern to avoid charges of nihilism represents one of the most significant preoccupations of Mādhyamika philosophers. This concern has to be understood in terms of the traditionally Buddhist idea of “two truths,” or two levels of explanation or description: the familiar level of discourse that includes reference to the “conventionally existent” (saṃvṛtisat), and the level which makes reference only to what is “ultimately existent” (parmārthasat). Most schools of Buddhist philosophy can be understood in terms of the sense in which they deny the “ultimate” existence of the self, while affirming its “conventional” existence.
In its basically Ābhidharmika iterations (that is, in the ways elaborated in the earliest scholastic literature of Indian Buddhism, the so-called “Abhidharma”) this denial of the ultimate existence of the self is an idea that can be understood as comparable to a great deal of contemporary philosophical discussion. Philosophical projects in cognitive science can be said, for example, to turn on questions of how (or perhaps whether) to relate two levels of description: (1) the broadly intentional level of description that generally reflects the first-person, phenomenological perspective (and that is also reflected in ordinary language and interactions), and (2) the scientific level of description at which the real explanatory work is done. Similarly, the broadly Ābhidharmika trajectory of Buddhist philosophy has it that the two truths basically consist in two sets of existing things: the set of conventionally existent (saṃvṛtisat) things and the set of ultimately existent (parmārthasat) things. The “conventionally existent” comprises all reducible or supervenient phenomena (basically, all temporally enduring macro-objects); the “ultimately existent” represents the set of ontological primitives, which the Abhidharma literature calls “dharmas.” It is ultimately the case, then, that causal interactions among the dharmas exhaustively explain all conventional events.
The works of Nāgārjuna and his philosophical heirs are best understood as constitutively opposed to this understanding of the two truths. The foundational idea of Madhyamaka is that the set of ultimately existent things is an empty set – a point that Mādhyamikas characteristically promote by insisting on the emptiness (śūnyatā) not only of wholes such as persons, but also of the analytic categories (dharmas) to which these are reduced in Abhidharma literature. The works of Nāgārjuna and his commentators, then, typically comprise arguments to the effect that none of the analytic categories (dharmas) and concepts used to explain anything can be coherently formulated. More precisely, the argument is that no such categories can intrinsically provide any explanatory purchase on the phenomena they purportedly explain.
In proceeding this way, Mādhyamikas can be understood to think that the ontologizing impulse of Abhidharma compromises the most important insight of the Buddhist tradition – which is, on the Mādhyamika reading, that all existents are “dependently originated” (pratītyasamutpanna). (The cardinal doctrine of the “dependent origination” of all existents represents the flip-side of the Buddhist denial of a “self”; that is, the reason we do not have unitary and enduring selves just is that any moment of experience can be explained as having originated from innumerable causes, none of which can be specified as what we “really” are.) More precisely, Mādhyamikas can be said to have recognized that the ontological primitives posited by Abhidharma could have explanatory purchase only if they are posited as an exception to the rule that everything is dependently originated; that is, dependently originated existents could only be ultimately explained by something that does not itself require the same kind of explanation. But it is precisely the Mādhyamika point to emphasize that there is no exception to this rule; phenomena are dependently originated all the way down, and it is therefore impossible to specify precisely what it is upon which anything finally depends. Hence, there can be no set of “ultimately existent” things.
Mādhyamika arguments to this effect typically work by showing that all explanatory categories turn out to be constitutively dependent upon the phenomena they purportedly explain – as, for example, notions such as “fire” and “fuel,” “action” and “agent,” or “cause” and “effect” are intelligible only relative to one another. To show the constitutively relative (that is, dependent) character of all such explanatory categories and phenomena is effectively to make the one point that Mādhyamikas are most concerned to make: that insofar as there is nothing that is not dependently originated, there is therefore nothing that is not “empty” (śūnya). (This paraphrases MMK 24.19, which says: “Since there is no dharma whatsoever that is not dependently originated, therefore there is no dharma whatsoever that is not empty.”)
In thus characterizing all categories and all existents as finally “empty,” what Mādhyamikas mean is that they are empty of what we may translate as “essence” (svabhāva). This is true just insofar as they exist not “essentially” (svabhāvena), but only relatively – that is, only in relation to other existents and categories. In arguing thus, Mādhyamikas – typifying characteristically Sanskritic styles of argumentation, in which the terms and analyses of the Sanskrit grammarians figure prominently – exploit the etymology of the word svabhāva. Although the semantic range of this Sanskrit word typically comprises ideas like “defining characteristic” or “identity,” the word can etymologically be read as referring to something “existent” (bhāva) “by itself” (sva-). Among the recently debated exegetical questions concerning Madhyamaka has been whether important Mādhyamika arguments centrally involve an equivocation on this term, unwarrantedly equating “identity” with “causally independent existence.”
It is not only in their characteristically Buddhist denial of a really existent “self,” but also in their more radical (and rhetorically charged) emphasis on the universally obtaining character of emptiness that Mādhyamikas recurrently elicited charges of nihilism – a charge as often issuing from proponents of other Buddhist schools as from the various Brahmanical schools of Indian philosophy. One of the most prominently recurrent sorts of exchange in Nāgārjuna’s MMK involves an interlocutor’s presupposing that by ‘emptiness’ Mādhyamikas must mean non-existence. For example, the twenty-fourth chapter of the MMK begins with the challenge of an imagined interlocutor (this one clearly another Buddhist): “If all this is empty, then there’s neither production nor destruction; it follows, for you, that the Four Noble Truths don’t exist.” (MMK 24.1) The rejoinder (at MMK 24.20): it is in fact only because everything is empty – which just is to say, dependently originated – that the Four Noble Truths can obtain. That is, the fact that existents only come into being in mutual dependence upon one another (and are therefore “empty” of an essence) is all that makes it possible for (what is the first Noble Truth) suffering to arise – and thus having arisen as a contingent and dependent phenomenon, to be caused to cease (the third Noble Truth). If, in contrast, suffering were the “natural” or “essential” state of affairs (svabhāva), this would (as Nāgārjuna sees it) mean that it could not be interrupted, and the cultivation of the entire Buddhist path would be impossible.
It is particularly important for the proponent of Madhyamaka to foreclose the possibility of a nihilist reading of claims regarding emptiness insofar as it is finally the ethical and soteriological project of Buddhist practice that is thought to be at stake. In this regard, the characteristically Mādhyamika conviction is that it is in fact the Ābhidharmika iteration of the Buddhist project (and not Mādhyamika claims regarding emptiness) that is “nihilist.” This is because on the characteristically Ābhidharmika understanding of the “two truths,” the world as “conventionally” described – as consisting, for example, in suffering persons whose plight should elicit compassionate dedication to the Buddhist path – is finally altogether superseded by the privileged level of description constitutively developed in the Abhidharma literature. The characteristically Ābhidharmika enumeration of the dharmas that putatively constitute the set of “ultimately existent” things amounts to the specification of what “really” exists instead of the self. If, in contrast, it is recognized that no such privileged level of description can coherently be elaborated – that, in other words, there is no set of ontological primitives in terms of which the only real explanatory work can be done, and that in that sense there is nothing “more real” than the world as conventionally described – then the world is finally to be accepted as irreducibly “conventional,” and the persons therein can hence be regarded as ethical agents who are not finally eliminable in terms of the analytic categories of Abhidharma.
But this understanding also raises what are surely the most philosophically complex and interesting problems in understanding Madhyamaka: if the constitutive claim of Madhyamaka is to be taken as one to the effect that the ultimate truth is that there is (in the sense described) no “ultimate truth,” it is easy to ask: What is the status of this claim itself? It would seem open to the Mādhyamika only to allow that it is itself conventionally true – but is that not just to say that one may as well choose not to adopt this particular “convention”? The problem, then, is whether characteristically Mādhyamika claims are, to the extent they are true, performatively self-contradictory or self-referentially incoherent. This problem was well understood (if not always clearly addressed) by proponents of Madhyamaka, and is very much in play in characteristically Mādhyamika claims to the effect that “emptiness” itself is empty – that, in other words, the Mādhyamika analysis is to be applied not only to all existents, but also to this analysis thereof.
To say as much is the only way consistently to affirm the universal scope of claims regarding emptiness; for there would clearly be a performative self-contradiction in claiming that “all existents are empty-cum-dependently-originated,” while yet allowing that claim itself to stand as an exception – as itself having, that is, the kind of “ultimately” privileged explanatory purchase that is denied with respect to all other analyses. But it is a complex matter whether the Mādhyamika can, in avoiding this route to self-contradiction, affirm the “emptiness of emptiness” without thereby depriving his own claim of any purchase. It is particularly at this point, then, that there is an air of paradox going to the heart of Mādhyamika discourse, finding expression in, for example, apparent claims to the effect that no claim is being made; hence, such quintessentially Mādhyamika tropes as the claim that Madhyamaka advances no philosophical “thesis” (pratijñā), and that “emptiness” does not reflect any specific “view” (dṛṣṭi).
Such rhetoric characteristically expresses what is surely the central interpretive and philosophical issue at stake in understanding Madhyamaka, and it is not surprising, in this regard, that Madhyamaka should often have been interpreted by modern scholars as having affinities with Hellenistic skepticism. Another line of interpretation (often inflected in recent years by appeal to Wittgenstein, or to various poststructuralist thinkers) has it that Mādhyamika claims not to be making any claim should be taken seriously as expressing a basically “therapeutic” sort of stance – one meant performatively to undermine (in something like the same way, perhaps, as in the Zen discourse of koans) soteriologically counter-productive profusions of discursive thought. This line of interpretation can be warranted by characteristically Mādhyamika talk about the elimination of prapañca (often translated as conceptual “proliferation”), and by paeans to the “ultimate truth” as something finally ineffable.
Such readings are, however, difficult to reconcile with what many Tibetan interpreters (perhaps notwithstanding such rhetoric) took to be the constitutively Mādhyamika claim: namely, that “emptiness” just means (and is the only way consistently to describe) “dependent origination.” If it is said, for example, that there is nothing “non-empty” just insofar as there is nothing that is not dependently originated (here again, paraphrasing MMK 24.19), that would seem to preclude, at least, the truth of statements (made, e.g., by certain theists) to the effect that there is something (e.g., God) that is necessarily (or otherwise not dependently) existent. If the Mādhyamika statement does not rule out the truth of such statements, then it would be difficult to understand it as meaning anything (although perhaps the radically “therapeutic” interpreter of Madhyamaka will here bite the bullet and, well, argue that it is the very idea of “meaning” anything that is to be jettisoned); but to say that the Mādhyamika claim contradicts a truth-claim proffered by some theists just is to say that the former claim, too, is proposed as true. Recognizing that, one might urge that the universal scope of the Mādhyamika claim entails that there is an important sense in which Madhyamaka is constitutively anti-skeptical – that, indeed, Mādhyamika arguments advance a finally metaphysical point. For example, one could argue that what is at stake here is the properly transcendental fact that emptiness (understood as the fact that things exist only interdependently) is a condition of the possibility of any existents and of any analysis thereof.
The question for the proponent of such a line of interpretation then becomes: If “the ultimate truth is that there is no ultimate truth,” is it possible to think of this claim as itself ultimately true? It is important to note, in this regard, that while Mādhyamikas characteristically (indeed, constitutively) eschew the Ābhidharmika idea that “ultimate truth” involves a domain of enumerable existents regarding which claims are to be judged for their adequacy, Madhyamaka nevertheless makes abundant reference to the “ultimate truth.” One way to make sense of this is to attribute to Madhyamaka a basically deflationist account of truth – that is, one according to which calling a claim “true” is to be explained not as predicating a metaphysical property (such as “correspondence” with “ultimately existent” things) of it, but simply as committing oneself to it. On such a view, to the extent that the (Ābhidharmika) idea of “ultimate truth” has been shown incoherent, all that remains is the level of “truth” that is characterized by common-sense realism.
This interpretation has the advantage of fitting quite well with the kind of traditional doxographical accounts (influentially developed, early on, by the Indian Mādhyamika Bhāvaviveka) that figure prominently in the Tibetan monastic curriculum. These represent the schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy in an ascending hierarchy of progressively more refined views, the understanding of each of which requires having rightly understood its predecessors. On such an account, Madhyamaka, though framed as an uncompromising critique of Ābhidharmika Buddhism, nevertheless depends on the latter: if the naive realism of non-Buddhas consists in thinking there is something more real (paradigmatically, selves) underlying our experience of the world, the realization of the “deflated” realism of Madhyamaka differs from that (and is therefore transformative) only insofar as one has first pursued to its limits the kind of reductionist exercise that shows how unstable is our naive self-grasping. If one has not first entertained the Ābhidharmika’s reductionist approach, then there would be no difference between the common-sense realism of the Mādhyamika, and that of ordinary ignorant persons. But if one realizes the necessary failure of the reductionist’s privileged level of description only after having entertained it, the resultant “realism” will be inflected by the transformative understanding that our selves are “real” in the only sense in which anything (even the purportedly “ultimate” existents that are dharmas) can be real – that is, relatively, dependently.
Another strategy (perhaps not mutually exclusive of the foregoing) is to emphasize that what Mādhyamikas refute, under the heading of “ultimate truth,” is simply the idea of a privileged level of description (in the form of a set of enumerable ontological primitives) – but that the abstract fact of there being no such set is itself really (indeed metaphysically) true. In that case, the salient point is just that the truth of the Mādhyamika claim does not consist in its reference to – its correspondence with – a specifiable domain of objects. This reconstruction can be coupled with an understanding of Mādhyamika arguments as basically transcendental arguments. Such an interpretation makes good sense, at least, of what is surely one of the most prominently recurrent rhetorical strategies of Nāgārjuna; so, Nāgārjuna can be understood to argue that his various interlocutors’ objections are incoherent just insofar as these very objections presuppose the truth of Nāgārjuna’s claims. Emptiness is not only not mutually exclusive of the Four Noble Truths – it is a condition of the possibility thereof. Emptiness is, moreover, a condition of the possibility even of an opponent’s denying this; for any analysis or denial at all (indeed, any cognitive act) consists, in the first instance, in some relation.
Perhaps more suggestively, such an interpretation can also help map the finally ethical concerns of Madhyamaka onto some contemporary arguments concerning reductionist accounts of the person. In this regard, it was noted that the Ābhidharmika trajectory of Buddhist philosophy can be understood as analogous to various projects in cognitive science. In the idiom of the latter, then, it could be said that the Ābhidharmika idea is that there is, “conventionally,” an intentional level of description (variously characterized as the “common-sense” view, “folk psychology,” etc.); and, “ultimately,” a scientific level of description, comprising the ontological primitives that alone are said “really” to exist, and exhaustively to explain the former level. One line of critique developed against such approaches is to argue that anyone offering an exhaustively “impersonal,” non-intentional description of (what we think of as) persons can be shown necessarily to presuppose precisely the personal, intentional level of description that is purportedly explained. Similarly, the upshot of the Mādhyamika argument that the world is (as expressed above) “irreducibly conventional” is that the level of description at which “persons” are in play cannot coherently be thought to be eliminable. Many of the commentator Candrakīrti’s arguments can be said, without too great a stretch, to make something like this point, recurrently urging against various interlocutors that any purported attempt to explain the conventional world (in terms that, if the proposed account is to have any explanatory purchase, must not themselves be conventional) inevitably founders on the unavoidability of presupposing the conventional senses of words.
Suffice it to say that the philosophical and exegetical issues in play here are highly complex, and that almost any attempt at understanding the texts of Nāgārjuna and his commentators is likely to require a considerable effort of rational reconstruction – which perhaps explains the enduring appeal of this trajectory of thought.
The Indian Buddhist tradition attests two broad streams in the interpretation of Nāgārjuna’s thought, corresponding roughly to what later Tibetan interpreters would refer to as the “Prāsaṅgika” and “Svātantrika” accounts of Madhyamaka. Interpreters of the former sort are so-called because of their view that Madhyamaka should be advanced only by reducing an opponent’s arguments to absurdity. Nāgārjuna is, on this view, to be interpreted as showing only the unwanted consequences (“prasaṅga”) entailed by his opponents’ claims, and not as defending any philosophical “thesis” (pratijñā) of his own. Svātantrikas, in contrast, are so-called because of their characteristic view that Nāgārjuna’s verses require restatement as formally valid inferences (svatantra-anumāna) whose conclusions are to be affirmed. Much contemporary debate has concerned whether these divergent lines of interpretation reflect only differing dialectical strategies, or whether (as influential Tibetan proponents of the distinction claim) they involve significantly different ontological presuppositions. Although the characterizations of these two trajectories of interpretation are not without basis in the antecedent Indian texts, this doxographic lens is of interest partly for what it can tell us about some characteristically Tibetan preoccupations (and about the influence of certain schools of Tibetan Buddhist philosophy on the contemporary interpretation of Indian Buddhist thought).
Names traditionally associated with the “Prāsaṅgika” stream of interpretation include Āryadeva, who is traditionally regarded as Nāgārjuna’s direct disciple (making his date close to Nāgārjuna’s), and who wrote the Catuḥśataka (“400 Verses”) – a text that is particularly important insofar as the divergent interpretations of it by the commentators Dharmapāla (530-561) and Candrakīrti are sometimes taken to herald a decisive split between Madhyamaka and Yogācāra (see Tillemans 1990); Buddhapālita (fl. c. 500), the author of a complete commentary (now extant only in Tibetan translation) on the MMK; and Candrakīrti (c. 600-650), whose Prasannapadā (“Clear Words”) – the only commentary on the MMK known to be extant in Sanskrit – preserves the Sanskrit text of Nāgārjuna’s verse text.
Candrakīrti is also the author of, among other works, the Madhyamakāvatāra (“Introduction to Madhyamaka”), an independent work (with auto-commentary) that represents the principal text for the “Madhyamaka” component of many Tibetan monastic curricula. This work is structured on the model of texts like the Daśabhūmika Sūtra, with chapters corresponding to that text’s progression in a bodhisattva’s mastery of ten “perfections” (pāramitā). The sixth chapter (fittingly corresponding to prajñāpāramitā, the “perfection of wisdom”) is by far the longest and the most philosophically rich, comprising, inter alia, important Mādhyamika critiques of Yogācāra.
Significant later Prāsaṅgikas include Śāntideva (fl. early eighth century), the author of the Bodhicaryāvatāra (“Introduction to the Conduct of Awakening”), an eloquent and popular text whose difficult ninth chapter (helpfully elaborated by the commentary of Prajñākaramati, who likely flourished in the tenth century) comprises important Mādhyamika arguments; and Dīpaṃkaraśrījñāna (982-1054; more popularly known as “Atiśa”), who figured prominently in the transmission of Indian Buddhism to Tibet, where he lived when he wrote the Bodhipathapradīpa (“A Lamp for the Path to Awakening”).
The “Svātantrika” line of interpretation originates with Bhāvaviveka (c. 500-570; his name is also reported as “Bhāviveka,” and he is often referred to as “Bhavya”), the author not only of a commentary on the MMK – the Prajñāpradīpa, now extant only in Tibetan and Chinese translations – but also of an independent work, the Madhyamakahṛdayakārikās, “Verses on the Heart of Madhyamaka,” with an auto-commentary entitled Tarkajvāla (“Blaze of Logic”). Other significant exponents of this line of thought include Jñānagarbha (fl. early eighth century), who is traditionally regarded as the teacher of Śāntarakṣita (725-788). The latter is the author of the Madhyamakālaṃkāra (“Ornament of Madhyamaka”), a relatively concise text elaborating Śāntarakṣita’s characteristic synthesis of Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. Śāntarakṣita is perhaps more widely known for the Tattvasaṃgraha (“Summa of Quiddities”), a massive treatise that takes on a huge range of Indian philosophical doctrines – and that quotes extensively from Brahmanical and other Buddhist philosophers, making it an important source of fragments from Indian works that do not, like the Tattvasaṃgraha, survive in Sanskrit.
The latter text is (like the Madhyamakālaṃkāra) helpfully illuminated by a commentary (the Tattvasaṃgrahapañjikā) by Śāntarakṣita’s student and disciple Kamalaśīla (c.740-795). The latter traveled with his teacher to Tibet, where both thinkers figure prominently in the founding events of Tibetan Buddhist thought. Kamalaśīla is, for example, traditionally regarded by Tibetans as having advocated the “gradualist” position in a famous debate at the bSam-yas monastery with a Chinese exponent of the Ch’an (“Zen”) understanding of “sudden enlightenment.” It was Kamalaśīla’s victory in this debate that established the “gradualist” understanding as at least officially normative for most schools of Tibetan Buddhism; while the occurrence of the debate itself may be apocryphal, such a position is surely reflected in Kamalaśīla’s three Bhāvanākrama (“stages of cultivation”) texts, written in Tibet.
As indicated, the so-called Svātantrika trajectory of Madhyamaka constitutively involves recourse to the tools of formal logic and inference, evincing a characteristic concern to restate Nāgārjuna’s arguments as formally valid inferences. More generally, it can be said that this approach is informed by Bhāvaviveka’s use of the logic and epistemology of Dignāga (c. 480-540), who influentially appealed to the idiom of pramāṇavidyā (the “discipline of logic and epistemology”) in advancing the Buddhist position – and who was, indeed, among the most important figures in developing the broadly Sanskritic conceptual vocabulary that would predominate in the subsequent course of Indian philosophy. Similarly, such later Svātantrikas as Śāntarakṣita were informed by the project of Dignāga’s influential expositor Dharmakīrti (c. 600-660), and figures such as Dharmakīrti and Śāntarakṣita would be of decisive importance for the remaining course of the Indian Buddhist philosophical tradition’s life. (Candrakīrti, in contrast, would exercise little influence in India, though he re-emerges with the Tibetan tradition’s interest in him.)
The dispute between these lines of interpretation crystallizes around the figures of Buddhapālita, Bhāvaviveka, and Candrakīrti – and can be seen, in particular, in their respective elaborations of Nāgārjuna’s MMK 1.1 (“There do not exist, anywhere at all, any existents whatsoever, arisen either from themselves or from something else, either from both or altogether without cause”). This verse basically deploys a standard tool in the Mādhyamika arsenal: the “tetralemma” (catuṣkoṭi), a four-fold statement that is meant to identify all possible relations between any category and its putative explananda (e.g., “the same,” “different,” “both the same and different,” “neither the same nor different”) – with the standard Mādhyamika denial of all four horns of the tetralemma meant as an exhaustive refutation of the efficacy and coherence of the category in question. (One modern interpretive discussion concerns whether or not this apparent violation of bivalent logic shows Mādhyamikas to have presupposed a non-standard sort of logic.)
Buddhapālita’s “prāsaṅgika” commentary on this verse does nothing more than make clear (what he takes to be) the absurd consequences that would be entailed by affirming any one of the positions here rejected. For example, the view that existents originate intrinsically – a position traditionally understood to express the Indian Sāṃkhya school’s characteristic view that effects are always latent within their causes – is to be denied “since there would be no point in the arising of already existent things.” That is, an affirmation of the causation of something from itself entails that the thing in question already exists, in which case, its coming-into-being could not be thought to require causal explanation.
In his commentary on the MMK, Bhāvaviveka then specifically took Buddhapālita to task, urging that Buddhapālita’s elaboration of the argument was unreasonable “because no reason and no example are given and because faults stated by the opponent are not answered” – which is to say, because the recognized terms of a formally stated inference (as that had been thematized by Sanskritic philosophers such as Dignāga) were not present. In contrast, then, to Buddhapālita, Bhāvaviveka offers a formally valid statement of the reasoning behind Nāgārjuna’s denial of the first horn of the verse’s tetralemma: “[Thesis:] It is certain that the inner sense fields (āyatanas) do not ultimately originate from themselves; [Reason:] because they exist [already], [Example:] like consciousness.” Among the characteristic features of Bhāvaviveka’s restatement here is his making explicit the qualifier “ultimately” (or “essentially,” svabhāvataḥ); that is, Nāgārjuna is here said to deny only that something is the case essentially or ultimately. While the first horn of this tetralemma (“existents are arisen from themselves”) perhaps requires no such qualification in order for its denial to be intelligible, many interpreters would agree that such a qualification must be added particularly in order for the denial of the second (which concerns that origination of things from other existents) to make any sense; for it is surely counter-intuitive to think that we cannot even conventionally speak of the origination of existents from one another. A great many of Nāgārjuna’s prima facie counter-intuitive refutations can be understood to make more sense if they are qualified as concerning what is “ultimately” or “essentially” the case (and not taken simpliciter).
A considerable portion of the first chapter of Candrakīrti’s Prasannapadā is then given over to defending Buddhapālita’s as the right way to proceed, and to criticizing Bhāvaviveka’s interpretive procedure as misguided. How, then, are we to make sense, without Bhāvaviveka’s characteristic qualification, of Nāgārjuna’s denial of the second horn of the tetralemma – of his denial, that is, that things originate from other existents? On Candrakīrti’s reading (which follows Buddhapālita’s), the absurdity that would be entailed by thinking otherwise would be that a sprout could just as well be produced from the coals of a fire as from a seed; and, conversely, if a sprout cannot be produced from the coals of a fire, it cannot be said to be produced from a seed, either. Candrakīrti’s argument here is usefully understood as involving a priori (as contra a posteriori) analysis; that is, the argument short-circuits any appeal to what we experience to be the case, instead analyzing only the concepts presupposed in how we explain experience – and the point is to reduce to absurdity any argument that presupposes the independence of such concepts (that presupposes, in other words, that any such concepts might afford a privileged perspective on what there is). Read this way, the argument turns simply on the definition of “other,” and the point is that the general concept of “otherness” leaves us with no principled way to know which other things are relevantly connected to the thing whose arising we seek to explain, and we are left to suppose that anything that is “other” than the latter (even the coals of a fire) could give rise to it.
Although many Tibetan exegetes were (as noted) inclined to see the dispute here as turning on subtle ontological presuppositions, this can be hard to glean from the Indian texts upon which the dispute is based. The characteristically Svātantrika appeal to the idiom of logic and epistemology can, however, be understood as meant to address what are real philosophical problems in the Mādhyamika project as that is understood by Candrakīrti – just as Candrakīrti, for his part, can be understood as having philosophically principled reasons for refusing the epistemological tools characteristically deployed by Bhāvaviveka and his heirs. What is at issue here is, once again, the question of how we are to regard the “conventionally” described world once the idea that there can be an “ultimately” true description thereof has been jettisoned. Nāgārjuna himself had emphasized the importance of some kind of relation in this regard, saying, for example, that “without relying on convention, the ultimate is not taught; without having understood the ultimate, nirvāṇa is not apprehended” (MMK 24.10). In other words, the (relative) reality of the conventionally described world is a condition of the possibility of our coming to understand what is ultimately the case; but if what is understood thereby is in fact that there is nothing “more real” than the conventionally described world – that, e.g., there are no ontological primitives that are not themselves subject to the conditions that obtain in the world – then it might be thought that, as it were, “anything goes.”
The philosophical worry, then, is that if Mādhyamika arguments are not understood in something like the way that Svātantrikas propose, Madhyamaka could degenerate into a thoroughgoing and pernicious conventionalism. The broadly Svātantrika line of interpretation attempts to address this worry by arguing that even if all discourse (including that of the Mādhyamika) perforce takes place at the “conventional” level, it is nevertheless the case that some “conventions” are more nearly true than others – and that the epistemological tools developed by Dignāga and Dharmakīrti give us the resources to sort these out. The Svātantrika Jñānagarbha (followed, in this regard, by his student Śāntarakṣita) emphasized that we can distinguish between “true convention” (tathya-saṃvṛti) and “false convention” (mithyā-saṃvṛti).
In his refusal of the characteristically “Svātantrika” use of the conceptual tools of Buddhist epistemology, Candrakīrti need not be understood as conceding simply that anything goes. Candrakīrti’s point, rather, would seem to be to emphasize that there can be no explanatory categories that do not themselves exhibit the same characteristics (chiefly, the fact of being dependently originated) already on display in the conventionally described world; and any constitutively analytic sort of reasoning (such as that exemplified by the discourse of epistemology) just is a search for something beyond what is already given in conventional discourse. What is “conventionally” true, then, is (by definition) just our conventions – and any demand for some account or explanation of these could be thought to provide some purchase only to the extent that what is demanded is something that is not itself “conventional.” But there cannot be any such discourse, any more than there can be an existent that is not dependently originated; the two claims are related insofar as all that could count as a discursively exhaustive explanation would be one that adduces something that is not itself subject to the constraints that it explains – which is to say, something not dependently originated. Although this may represent an adequate reconstruction of his position, Candrakīrti’s emphasis on the definitively “non-analytic” character of conventional discourse can, nevertheless, reasonably be thought to leave his project vulnerable to charges of incoherence, and it can be seen that the issues in dispute between Svātantrikas and Prāsaṅgika are the same paradoxes that bedevil Madhyamaka more generally.
Indian Madhyamaka figures decisively in most of the Tibetan schools of Buddhist philosophy, which tend to agree in judging Madhyamaka to represent the pinnacle of Buddhist thought. There are, however, interesting historical and philosophical developments that greatly complicate this picture. For example, while the scholastic traditions of Indian Buddhist philosophy were first introduced to Tibet by the “Svātantrika” Mādhyamikas Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla, many schools of Tibetan Buddhism nevertheless claim Candrakīrti’s (“Prāsaṅgika”) interpretation as authoritative – a fact partly owing, perhaps, to the influence of Atiśa in the so-called “second dissemination” of Indian Buddhism to Tibet (that is, the period during which Indian Buddhism was decisively established in Tibet, and during which the systematic translation of Indian Buddhist texts into Tibetan was brought to fruition). However, the characteristically Tibetan emphasis on “Vajrayāna” (that is, tantric) forms of practice arguably promotes greater recourse to the idiom of Yogācāra than would be encouraged by Candrakīrti. In addition, there are, as noted, philosophical reasons for qualifying some of Candrakīrti’s positions. Hence, even those Tibetan schools (such as the dGe-lugs) that most forcefully assert the authoritative character of “Prāsaṅgika” Madhyamaka tend, for example, to support their interpretation with significant studies in the Buddhist epistemological tradition – a move, as noted, definitively characteristic of the “Svātantrika” approach.
The attempt thus to wed Madhyamaka to the philosophical project of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti is worth appreciating not only because it is intrinsically interesting, but because, particularly in the United States in the latter part of the 20th century, a great many modern interpreters of Indian Madhyamaka have been influenced by characteristically Tibetan appropriations of this tradition. While this has arguably led to some distortions in the exegesis particularly of Candrakīrti’s texts, there is much to recommend the Tibetans’ systematic (as opposed to historical) presentation of Madhyamaka in relation to the other schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy. As indicated, a distinctive feature of characteristically Tibetan presentations of Buddhist philosophy is the use of doxographical digests elaborating what are called “established conclusions” (grub mtha’; this translates the Sanskrit siddhānta).
On this model, the various schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy (principally consisting, according to such presentations, in the two “Ābhidharmika” schools of the Vaibhāṣikas and Sautrāntikas, and the two “Mahāyāna” schools of Yogācāra and Madhyamaka) are represented in an ascending hierarchy of progressively more refined positions, the proper understanding of each of which requires understanding its predecessors. Ascent through the hierarchy is characterized, most basically, by the progressive elimination of ontological commitments: the two Ābhidharmika schools divide over the question of what are to be admitted as “dharmas” qualifying for inclusion in a final ontology; Yogācāra further pares down this list to nothing but mental events; the “Svātantrika” Mādhyamikas are represented as retaining only the vestigial ontological commitments that are thought to be entailed by their characteristic deference to the dialectical tools of epistemology; until, with the “Prāsaṅgika” iteration of Madhyamaka, we arrive at the school of thought for which the set of “ultimately existent” (paramārthasat) phenomena is an empty set.
The effect of this is to throw our attention back to the only “set” of existents with any remaining content: the conventionally described world, now understood as ineliminable. Hence, on this view, there is the avoidance of (what Mādhyamikas are always trying to eschew) the extreme of nihilism or “eliminativism” (ucchedavāda); but there is also the (constitutively Buddhist) avoidance of the extreme of “eternalism,” insofar as the effect of cultivating the Mādhyamika insight only as the culminating stage in a progression is (it is claimed) to have driven home the realization that the self exists (like everything “conventional”) only relatively or dependently. Once the project of a privileged level of description has been abandoned, the “common-sense realism” that remains can be seen to differ from that of the unenlightened “by virtue of its being adopted in full cognizance of the progression through the intervening stages” (Siderits 2003, 185).
The same insight is reflected in the basic monastic curriculum of dGe-lugs-pa monasteries, which is structured around five topics defined by representative Indian texts: The Vinaya, or Buddhist monastic code, as represented by the Vinaya Sūtra of Guṇaprabha; Abhidharma, as represented by the Abhidharmakośa of Vasubandhu; logic and epistemology, as represented by the Pramāṇavārttika of Dharmakīrti; Madhyamaka, as represented by Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra; and the stages on the path to enlightenment, as represented by the Abhisamayālaṃkāra attributed to Maitreya. In this way, the study of the Madhyamaka tradition of Buddhist philosophy comes only in the context of an overarching education in a complete Buddhist world-view, such that characteristically Mādhyamika teachings concerning “emptiness” are – like the Prajñāpāramitā Sūtras whose retrieval by Nāgārjuna was thought to introduce Mahāyāna as representing the Buddha’s definitive teaching – made intelligible by the necessarily propaedeutic earlier teachings. Above all, it is the finally ethical character of Mādhyamika thought that is encouraged by this pedagogical system; for the characteristically Mādhyamika claim that “all dharmas are empty” – that, in other words, Abhidharma’s reductionist account of the person cannot finally be made coherent – cannot be understood as nihilistic if it has been made clear that the upshot of it is to return our attention to the irreducibly conventional world in which persons live and suffer.
Tibetan tradition preserves, however, not only a model for the integration of Madhyamaka philosophy into a structured set of transformative religious practices, but also a great deal of innovative and sophisticated philosophical elaboration of Mādhyamika thought. For example, the prolific scholar Tsong-kha-pa (1357-1419) – originator of the influential reformist school that would style itself the “dGe-lugs” (“virtuous way”) – did much to integrate the Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka of Candrakīrti with the understanding and teaching of Buddhist epistemology stemming from Dharmakīrti. Tsong-kha-pa’s works (such as the massive Lam rim chen mo, “Great [treatise on] the Stages of the Path”) also bring considerable sophistication to bear on the question of how Madhyamaka ought to be understood in relation to Yogācāra. Critics of Tsong-kha-pa – such as, notably, the Sa-skya-pa scholar Go-ram-pa bSod-nams seng-ge (1429-1489) – stridently condemned his confidence that the discourse of epistemology could bring Mādhyamika analysis into contact with ultimate reality. On Go-ram-pa’s reading, such confidence amounts to the claim that the discursive thought that understands “ultimate truth” is itself ultimately true – which is to confuse the (necessarily conventional) activity of thinking about ultimate truth with what it is that such thought is about. Go-ram-pa claims that Tsong-kha-pa’s account of Madhyamaka entails the nihilistic conclusion that what is ultimately true is simply what is conventionally true. This Tibetan debate, then, recognizably addresses the perennially vexed issues that go to the heart of Madhyamaka: those concerning how we are to understand the relation between ultimate and conventional truth, in the context of a claim to the effect that “the ultimate truth is that there is no ultimate truth.”
It is frequently observed that while Indo-Tibetan schools of Buddhist philosophy characteristically developed around the systematic treatises (śāstras) of historical thinkers like Nāgārjuna and Dignāga, Chinese Buddhist philosophy instead centers on (and its schools are largely defined by) the interpretation of particular Buddhist sūtras. Whatever truth there may be in this, it is certainly the case that a great deal of systematic Indian Buddhist philosophy from the mature scholastic phase of the tradition (roughly, from the sixth century on) was never translated into Chinese. Although the texts of (say) Nāgārjuna, Vasubandhu, and Dignāga are available in Chinese translation, the Chinese canon does not include the works of such thinkers as Candrakīrti, Dharmakīrti, or Śāntarakṣita – the later Mādhyamikas and epistemologists whose works decisively shaped Indo-Tibetan traditions of interpretation. Accordingly, the development of Madhyamaka in China centers on a somewhat different group of texts – all of them translated by the great translator Kumārajīva (350-409), whose efforts figure prominently in the Chinese reception of Madhyamaka. So, the Chinese analogue of the Indian Madhyamaka school was originally styled San-lun, the “Three Śāstra” school, so called for its reliance upon three of Kumārajīva’s translations. Only one of these (the MMK, here called Chung lun, “Madhyamakaśāstra”; Taishō 1564) has an extant Sanskrit antecedent. The other two – the Dvādaśanikāyaśāstra (Shih erh men lun, Taishō 1568), attributed to Nāgārjuna, and the Śata[ka]śāstra (Pai lun, Taishō 1569), attributed to Āryadeva – are extant neither in Sanskrit nor in Tibetan translation.
It was, however, arguably another treatise attributed to Nāgārjuna (and also “translated” by Kumārajīva) that was ultimately to have greater influence on East Asian interpretations of Madhyamaka: the Ta-chih-tu lun, or *Mahāprajñāpāramitopadeśa Śāstra (“Treatise which is a Teaching on the Great Perfection of Wisdom [Sūtra]”). This text – a massive summa of Buddhist doctrine, comparable in scope to the *Vijñaptimātratāsiddhi (which is ostensibly a digest and compilation of several Indian commentaries on one of the works by Vasubandhu that is foundational for Yogācāra) – is extant in no other translation than Kumārajīva’s, and comprises a great deal of material that is not easily reconciled with what is taught in Nāgārjuna’s MMK. However, despite the scholarly consensus to the effect that this text is not authentically attributed to Nāgārjuna, East Asian authors citing Nāgārjuna tend most frequently to cite Kumārajīva’s text (and not the MMK). The reasons for this are, along with one of the salient features of characteristically East Asian interpretations of Nāgārjuna, reflected in a comment by the Japanese scholar Junjirō Takakusu, who observed that while such Mādhyamika texts as the MMK are “much inclined to be negativistic idealism,” in the Ta-chih-tu lun “we see that [Nāgārjuna] establishes his monistic view much more affirmatively than in any other text” (Takakusu 1949: 100).
Takakusu’s assessment of the MMK as “negativistic” arguably relates to the ways in which characteristically East Asian interpretations of Madhyamaka have been (not surprisingly) influenced by the vicissitudes of Chinese translations from Sanskrit. For example, it has been noted (by, e.g., Swanson 1989: 14) that Chinese terms centrally associated with the two truths – yu (“existence” or “being”) and wu (“non-existence” or non-being”), identified, respectively, with saṃvṛtisatya (conventional truth) and paramārthasatya (ultimate truth) – had strongly ontological implications that can alter the sense of characteristically Mādhyamika claims (originally stated in Sanskrit) when those were translated into Chinese. In particular, the ontologically “negative” sense of the term wu has arguably had the effect of recommending that Mādhyamika claims regarding emptiness be taken (notwithstanding Nāgārjuna’s repeated cautions in this regard) as rather more nihilistic than was intended.
We can consider, in this regard, chapter 24, verse 18 of Nāgārjuna’s MMK – a pivotal verse that may be rendered: “We call that which is dependent origination [pratītyasamutpāda] emptiness [śūnyatā]. That [emptiness,] a relative indication [upādāya prajñapti], is itself the middle path [madhyamā pratipad].” This often cited (and variously translated) verse is significant chiefly for its asserting that the authentic “middle path” – and hence (given the centrality of the middle way trope in Buddhist thought) the authentically Buddhist doctrine – lies in realizing the identity of three terms: dependent origination, emptiness, and “dependent designation” or “relative indication” (upādāya prajñapti). The semantic range of the latter term is such as to suggest that emptiness-cum-dependent origination is itself “conventional,” and one upshot of the verse is therefore to express, in effect, the idea of the “emptiness of emptiness.” More straightforwardly, though, this verse clearly represents one of the countless occasions on which Nāgārjuna is concerned to emphasize that by “emptiness” he means simply “dependent origination.”
On one characteristically East Asian interpretation of this verse (that of the modern Japanese scholar Gadjin Nagao), however, we are to understand here that the verse’s initial predication (“we call that which is dependent origination emptiness”) amounts to a negation of (the ontologically “positive” phenomenon which is) dependent origination. As Nagao states this idea, “This pratītya-samutpāda dies in the second [quarter verse].” The second predication – which characterizes this “emptiness” as a “relative indication” – then amounts to a return to the ontologically “positive.” On this reading, then, the verse “is dialectical, moving from affirmation to negation and again to affirmation.” (Nagao 1991: 193-94) This “dialectical” reading of a quintessentially Mādhyamika claim is frequently encountered in modern Japanese scholarship – a fact that arguably reflects the extent to which many Japanese scholars (even those who have developed deep acquaintance with the Sanskrit texts of Indian Buddhism) have their initial grounding in the characteristically East Asian traditions of interpretation in which the Ta-chih-tu lun of Kumārajīva is paramount.
Another characteristic preoccupation of East Asian interpreters of Madhyamaka is one also evident in some of the Indo-Tibetan traditions of interpretation: that of attempting to harmonize Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. In the East Asian case, the fact that so many Buddhist interpreters of Madhyamaka should attempt – notwithstanding the extent to which many Indian Mādhyamika and Yogācāra texts are framed as mutually polemical – to develop a synthesis of these two great schools of Mahāyāna philosophy partly reflects the predominance of Yogācāra in East Asian Buddhist thought. If, however, Madhyamaka philosophy was largely eclipsed by Yogācāra (and more importantly, by other indigenous developments) in the East Asian context, it nevertheless arguably lives on in the enigmatic discourse of Ch’an/Zen Buddhism that many take to be quintessentially East Asian. While any Mādhyamika influence on Zen is surely indirect, the latter tradition’s particular debt to the Prajñāpāramitā literature (the Vajracchedikā, or “Diamond,” Sūtra figures most importantly here) perhaps explains why many modern observers are inclined to see affinities with Madhyamaka.
University of Chicago Divinity School
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 31, 2005 | Originally published: