Francis Bacon (1561—1626)
Sir Francis Bacon (later Lord Verulam and the Viscount St. Albans) was an English lawyer, statesman, essayist, historian, intellectual reformer, philosopher, and champion of modern science. Early in his career he claimed “all knowledge as his province” and afterwards dedicated himself to a wholesale revaluation and re-structuring of traditional learning. To take the place of the established tradition (a miscellany of Scholasticism, humanism, and natural magic), he proposed an entirely new system based on empirical and inductive principles and the active development of new arts and inventions, a system whose ultimate goal would be the production of practical knowledge for “the use and benefit of men” and the relief of the human condition.
At the same time that he was founding and promoting this new project for the advancement of learning, Bacon was also moving up the ladder of state service. His career aspirations had been largely disappointed under Elizabeth I, but with the ascension of James his political fortunes rose. Knighted in 1603, he was then steadily promoted to a series of offices, including Solicitor General (1607), Attorney General (1613), and eventually Lord Chancellor (1618). While serving as Chancellor, he was indicted on charges of bribery and forced to leave public office. He then retired to his estate where he devoted himself full time to his continuing literary, scientific, and philosophical work. He died in 1626, leaving behind a cultural legacy that, for better or worse, includes most of the foundation for the triumph of technology and for the modern world as we currently know it.
Table of Contents
- Life and Political Career
- Thought and Writings
- Reputation and Cultural Legacy
- References and Further Reading
Sir Francis Bacon (later Lord Verulam, the Viscount St. Albans, and Lord Chancellor of England) was born in London in 1561 to a prominent and well-connected family. His parents were Sir Nicholas Bacon, the Lord Keeper of the Seal, and Lady Anne Cooke, daughter of Sir Anthony Cooke, a knight and one-time tutor to the royal family. Lady Anne was a learned woman in her own right, having acquired Greek and Latin as well as Italian and French. She was a sister-in-law both to Sir Thomas Hoby, the esteemed English translator of Castiglione, and to Sir William Cecil (later Lord Burghley), Lord Treasurer, chief counselor to Elizabeth I, and from 1572-1598 the most powerful man in England.
Bacon was educated at home at the family estate at Gorhambury in Herfordshire. In 1573, at the age of just twelve, he entered Trinity College, Cambridge, where the stodgy Scholastic curriculum triggered his lifelong opposition to Aristotelianism (though not to the works of Aristotle himself).
In 1576 Bacon began reading law at Gray’s Inn. Yet only a year later he interrupted his studies in order to take a position in the diplomatic service in France as an assistant to the ambassador. In 1579, while he was still in France, his father died, leaving him (as the second son of a second marriage and the youngest of six heirs) virtually without support. With no position, no land, no income, and no immediate prospects, he returned to England and resumed the study of law.
Bacon completed his law degree in 1582, and in 1588 he was named lecturer in legal studies at Gray’s Inn. In the meantime, he was elected to Parliament in 1584 as a member for Melcombe in Dorsetshire. He would remain in Parliament as a representative for various constituencies for the next 36 years.
In 1593 his blunt criticism of a new tax levy resulted in an unfortunate setback to his career expectations, the Queen taking personal offense at his opposition. Any hopes he had of becoming Attorney General or Solicitor General during her reign were dashed, though Elizabeth eventually relented to the extent of appointing Bacon her Extraordinary Counsel in 1596.
It was around this time that Bacon entered the service of Robert Devereux, the Earl of Essex, a dashing courtier, soldier, plotter of intrigue, and sometime favorite of the Queen. No doubt Bacon viewed Essex as a rising star and a figure who could provide a much-needed boost to his own sagging career. Unfortunately, it was not long before Essex’s own fortunes plummeted following a series of military and political blunders culminating in a disastrous coup attempt. When the coup plot failed, Devereux was arrested, tried, and eventually executed, with Bacon, in his capacity as Queen’s Counsel, playing a vital role in the prosecution of the case.
In 1603, James I succeeded Elizabeth, and Bacon’s prospects for advancement dramatically improved. After being knighted by the king, he swiftly ascended the ladder of state and from 1604-1618 filled a succession of high-profile advisory positions:
- 1604 – Appointed King’s Counsel.
- 1607 – Named Solicitor General.
- 1608 – Appointed Clerk of the Star Chamber.
- 1613 – Appointed Attorney General.
- 1616 – Made a member of the Privy Council.
- 1617 – Appointed Lord Keeper of the Royal Seal (his father’s former office).
- 1618 – Made Lord Chancellor.
As Lord Chancellor, Bacon wielded a degree of power and influence that he could only have imagined as a young lawyer seeking preferment. Yet it was at this point, while he stood at the very pinnacle of success, that he suffered his great Fall. In 1621 he was arrested and charged with bribery. After pleading guilty, he was heavily fined and sentenced to a prison term in the Tower of London. Although the fine was later waived and Bacon spent only four days in the Tower, he was never allowed to sit in Parliament or hold political office again.
The entire episode was a terrible disgrace for Bacon personally and a stigma that would cling to and injure his reputation for years to come. As various chroniclers of the case have pointed out, the accepting of gifts from suppliants in a law suit was a common practice in Bacon’s day, and it is also true that Bacon ended up judging against the two petitioners who had offered the fateful bribes. Yet the damage was done, and Bacon to his credit accepted the judgment against him without excuse. According to his own Essayes, or Counsels, he should have known and done better. (In this respect it is worth noting that during his forced retirement, Bacon revised and republished the Essayes, injecting an even greater degree of shrewdness into a collection already notable for its worldliness and keen political sense.) Macaulay in a lengthy essay declared Bacon a great intellect but (borrowing a phrase from Bacon’s own letters) a “most dishonest man,” and more than one writer has characterized him as cold, calculating, and arrogant. Yet whatever his flaws, even his enemies conceded that during his trial he accepted his punishment nobly, and moved on.
Bacon spent his remaining years working with renewed determination on his lifelong project: the reform of learning and the establishment of an intellectual community dedicated to the discovery of scientific knowledge for the “use and benefit of men.” The former Lord Chancellor died on 9 April, 1626, supposedly of a cold or pneumonia contracted while testing his theory of the preservative and insulating properties of snow.
In a way Bacon’s descent from political power was a fortunate fall, for it represented a liberation from the bondage of public life resulting in a remarkable final burst of literary and scientific activity. As Renaissance scholar and Bacon expert Brian Vickers has reminded us, Bacon’s earlier works, impressive as they are, were essentially products of his “spare time.” It was only during his last five years that he was able to concentrate exclusively on writing and produce, in addition to a handful of minor pieces:
- Two substantial volumes of history and biography, The History of the Reign of King Henry the Seventh and The History of the Reign of King Henry the Eighth.
- De Augmentis Scientiarum (an expanded Latin version of his earlier Advancement of Learning).
- The final 1625 edition of his Essayes, or Counsels.
- The remarkable Sylva Sylvarum, or A Natural History in Ten Centuries (a curious hodge-podge of scientific experiments, personal observations, speculations, ancient teachings, and analytical discussions on topics ranging from the causes of hiccups to explanations for the shortage of rain in Egypt). Artificially divided into ten “centuries” (that is, ten chapters, each consisting of one hundred items), the work was apparently intended to be included in Part Three of the Magna Instauratio.
- His utopian science-fiction novel The New Atlantis, which was published in unfinished form a year after his death.
- Various parts of his unfinished magnum opus Magna Instauratio (or Great Instauration), including a “Natural History of Winds” and a “Natural History of Life and Death.”
These late productions represented the capstone of a writing career that spanned more than four decades and encompassed virtually an entire curriculum of literary, scientific, and philosophical studies.
Despite the fanatical claims (and very un-Baconian credulity) of a few admirers, it is a virtual certainty that Bacon did not write the works traditionally attributed to William Shakespeare. Even so, the Lord Chancellor’s high place in the history of English literature as well as his influential role in the development of English prose style remain well-established and secure. Indeed even if Bacon had produced nothing else but his masterful Essayes (first published in 1597 and then revised and expanded in 1612 and 1625), he would still rate among the top echelon of 17th-century English authors. And so when we take into account his other writings, e.g., his histories, letters, and especially his major philosophical and scientific works, we must surely place him in the first rank of English literature’s great men of letters and among its finest masters (alongside names like Johnson, Mill, Carlyle, and Ruskin) of non-fiction prose.
Bacon’s style, though elegant, is by no means as simple as it seems or as it is often described. In fact it is actually a fairly complex affair that achieves its air of ease and clarity more through its balanced cadences, natural metaphors, and carefully arranged symmetries than through the use of plain words, commonplace ideas, and straightforward syntax. (In this connection it is noteworthy that in the revised versions of the essays Bacon seems to have deliberately disrupted many of his earlier balanced effects to produce a style that is actually more jagged and, in effect, more challenging to the casual reader.)
Furthermore, just as Bacon’s personal style and living habits were prone to extravagance and never particularly austere, so in his writing he was never quite able to resist the occasional grand word, magniloquent phrase, or orotund effect. (As Dr. Johnson observed, “A dictionary of the English language might be compiled from Bacon’s works alone.”) Bishop Sprat in his 1667 History of the Royal Society honored Bacon and praised the society membership for supposedly eschewing fine words and fancy metaphors and adhering instead to a natural lucidity and “mathematical plainness.” To write in such a way, Sprat suggested, was to follow true, scientific, Baconian principles. And while Bacon himself often expressed similar sentiments (praising blunt expression while condemning the seductions of figurative language), a reader would be hard pressed to find many examples of such spare technique in Bacon’s own writings. Of Bacon’s contemporary readers, at least one took exception to the view that his writing represented a perfect model of plain language and transparent meaning. After perusing the New Organon, King James (to whom Bacon had proudly dedicated the volume) reportedly pronounced the work “like the peace of God, which passeth all understanding.”
As a work of narrative fiction, Bacon’s novel New Atlantis may be classified as a literary rather than a scientific (or philosophical) work, though it effectively belongs to both categories. According to Bacon’s amanuensis and first biographer William Rawley, the novel represents the first part (showing the design of a great college or institute devoted to the interpretation of nature) of what was to have been a longer and more detailed project (depicting the entire legal structure and political organization of an ideal commonwealth). The work thus stands in the great tradition of the utopian-philosophical novel that stretches from Plato and More to Huxley and Skinner.
The thin plot or fable is little more than a fictional shell to contain the real meat of Bacon’s story: the elaborate description of Salomon’s House (also known as the College of the Six Days Works), a centrally organized research facility where specially trained teams of investigators collect data, conduct experiments, and (most importantly from Bacon’s point of view) apply the knowledge they gain to produce “things of use and practice for man’s life.” These new arts and inventions they eventually share with the outside world.
In terms of its sci-fi adventure elements, the New Atlantis is about as exciting as a government or university re-organization plan. But in terms of its historical impact, the novel has proven to be nothing less than revolutionary, having served not only as an effective inspiration and model for the British Royal Society, but also as an early blueprint and prophecy of the modern research center and international scientific community.
It is never easy to summarize the thought of a prolific and wide-ranging philosopher. Yet Bacon somewhat simplifies the task by his own helpful habits of systematic classification and catchy mnemonic labeling. (Thus, for example, there are three “distempers” – or diseases – of learning,” eleven errors or “peccant humours,” four “Idols,” three primary mental faculties and categories of knowledge, etc.) In effect, by following Bacon’s own methods it is possible to produce a convenient outline or overview of his main scientific and philosophical ideas.
As early as 1592, in a famous letter to his uncle, Lord Burghley, Bacon declared “all knowledge” to be his province and vowed his personal commitment to a plan for the full-scale rehabilitation and reorganization of learning. In effect, he dedicated himself to a long-term project of intellectual reform, and the balance of his career can be viewed as a continuing effort to make good on that pledge. In 1620, while he was still at the peak of his political success, he published the preliminary description and plan for an enormous work that would fully answer to his earlier declared ambitions. The work, dedicated to James, was to be called Magna Instauratio (that is, the “grand edifice” or Great Instauration), and it would represent a kind of summa or culmination of all Bacon’s thought on subjects ranging from logic and epistemology to practical science (or what in Bacon’s day was called “natural philosophy,” the word science being then but a general synonym for “wisdom” or “learning”).
Like several of Bacon’s projects, the Instauratio in its contemplated form was never finished. Of the intended six parts, only the first two were completed, while the other portions were only partly finished or barely begun. Consequently, the work as we have it is less like the vast but well-sculpted monument that Bacon envisioned than a kind of philosophical miscellany or grab-bag. Part I of the project, De Dignitate et Augmentis Scientiarum (“Nine Books of the Dignity and Advancement of Learning”), was published in 1623. It is basically an enlarged version of the earlier Proficience and Advancement of Learning, which Bacon had presented to James in 1605. Part II, the Novum Organum (or “New Organon”) provides the author’s detailed explanation and demonstration of the correct procedure for interpreting nature. It first appeared in 1620. Together these two works present the essential elements of Bacon’s philosophy, including most of the major ideas and principles that we have come to associate with the terms “Baconian” and “Baconianism.”
Relatively early in his career Bacon judged that, owing mainly to an undue reverence for the past (as well as to an excessive absorption in cultural vanities and frivolities), the intellectual life of Europe had reached a kind of impasse or standstill. Yet he believed there was a way beyond this stagnation if persons of learning, armed with new methods and insights, would simply open their eyes and minds to the world around them. This at any rate was the basic argument of his seminal 1605 treatise The Proficience and Advancement of Learning, arguably the first important philosophical work to be published in English.
It is in this work that Bacon sketched out the main themes and ideas that he continued to refine and develop throughout his career, beginning with the notion that there are clear obstacles to or diseases of learning that must be avoided or purged before further progress is possible.
“There be therefore chiefly three vanities in studies, whereby learning hath been most traduced.” Thus Bacon, in the first book of the Advancement. He goes on to refer to these vanities as the three “distempers” of learning and identifies them (in his characteristically memorable fashion) as “fantastical learning,” “contentious learning,” and “delicate learning” (alternatively identified as “vain imaginations,” “vain altercations,” and “vain affectations”).
By fantastical learning (“vain imaginations”) Bacon had in mind what we would today call pseudo-science: i.e., a collection of ideas that lack any real or substantial foundation, that are professed mainly by occultists and charlatans, that are carefully shielded from outside criticism, and that are offered largely to an audience of credulous true believers. In Bacon’s day such “imaginative science” was familiar in the form of astrology, natural magic, and alchemy.
By contentious learning (“vain altercations”) Bacon was referring mainly to Aristotelian philosophy and theology and especially to the Scholastic tradition of logical hair-splitting and metaphysical quibbling. But the phrase applies to any intellectual endeavor in which the principal aim is not new knowledge or deeper understanding but endless debate cherished for its own sake.
Delicate learning (“vain affectations”) was Bacon’s label for the new humanism insofar as (in his view) it seemed concerned not with the actual recovery of ancient texts or the retrieval of past knowledge but merely with the revival of Ciceronian rhetorical embellishments and the reproduction of classical prose style. Such preoccupation with “words more than matter,” with “choiceness of phrase” and the “sweet falling of clauses” – in short, with style over substance – seemed to Bacon (a careful stylist in his own right) the most seductive and decadent literary vice of his age.
Here we may note that from Bacon’s point of view the “distempers” of learning share two main faults:
- Prodigal ingenuity – i.e., each distemper represents a lavish and regrettable waste of talent, as inventive minds that might be employed in more productive pursuits exhaust their energy on trivial or puerile enterprises instead.
- Sterile results – i.e., instead of contributing to the discovery of new knowledge (and thus to a practical “advancement of learning” and eventually to a better life for all), the distempers of learning are essentially exercises in personal vainglory that aim at little more than idle theorizing or the preservation of older forms of knowledge.
In short, in Bacon’s view the distempers impede genuine intellectual progress by beguiling talented thinkers into fruitless, illusory, or purely self-serving ventures. What is needed – and this is a theme reiterated in all his later writings on learning and human progress – is a program to re-channel that same creative energy into socially useful new discoveries.
Though it is hard to pinpoint the birth of an idea, for all intents and purposes the modern idea of technological “progress” (in the sense of a steady, cumulative, historical advance in applied scientific knowledge) began with Bacon’s The Advancement of Learning and became fully articulated in his later works.
Knowledge is power, and when embodied in the form of new technical inventions and mechanical discoveries it is the force that drives history – this was Bacon’s key insight. In many respects this idea was his single greatest invention, and it is all the more remarkable for its having been conceived and promoted at a time when most English and European intellectuals were either reverencing the literary and philosophical achievements of the past or deploring the numerous signs of modern degradation and decline. Indeed, while Bacon was preaching progress and declaring a brave new dawn of scientific advance, many of his colleagues were persuaded that the world was at best creaking along towards a state of senile immobility and eventual darkness. “Our age is iron, and rusty too,” wrote John Donne, contemplating the signs of universal decay in a poem published six years after Bacon’s Advancement.
That history might in fact be progressive, i.e., an onward and upward ascent – and not, as Aristotle had taught, merely cyclical or, as cultural pessimists from Hesiod to Spengler have supposed, a descending or retrograde movement, became for Bacon an article of secular faith which he propounded with evangelical force and a sense of mission. In the Advancement, the idea is offered tentatively, as a kind of hopeful hypothesis. But in later works such as the New Organon, it becomes almost a promised destiny: Enlightenment and a better world, Bacon insists, lie within our power; they require only the cooperation of learned citizens and the active development of the arts and sciences.
In Book II of De Dignitate (his expanded version of the Advancement) Bacon outlines his scheme for a new division of human knowledge into three primary categories: History, Poesy, and Philosophy (which he associates respectively with the three fundamental “faculties” of mind – memory, imagination, and reason). Although the exact motive behind this reclassification remains unclear, one of its main consequences seems unmistakable: it effectively promotes philosophy – and especially Baconian science – above the other two branches of knowledge, in essence defining history as the mere accumulation of brute facts, while reducing art and imaginative literature to the even more marginal status of “feigned history.”
Evidently Bacon believed that in order for a genuine advancement of learning to occur, the prestige of philosophy (and particularly natural philosophy) had to be elevated, while that of history and literature (in a word, humanism) needed to be reduced. Bacon’s scheme effectively accomplishes this by making history (the domain of fact, i.e., of everything that has happened) a virtual sub-species of philosophy (the domain of realistic possibility, i.e., of everything that can theoretically or actually occur). Meanwhile, poesy (the domain of everything that is imaginable or conceivable) is set off to the side as a mere illustrative vehicle. In essence, it becomes simply a means of recreating actual scenes or events from the past (as in history plays or heroic poetry) or of allegorizing or dramatizing new ideas or future possibilities (as in Bacon’s own interesting example of “parabolic poesy,” the New Atlantis.)
To the second part of his Great Instauration Bacon gave the title New Organon (or “True Directions concerning the Interpretation of Nature”). The Greek word organon means “instrument” or “tool,” and Bacon clearly felt he was supplying a new instrument for guiding and correcting the mind in its quest for a true understanding of nature. The title also glances at Aristotle’s Organon (a collection that includes his Categories and his Prior and Posterior Analytics) and thus suggests a “new instrument” destined to transcend or replace the older, no longer serviceable one. (This notion of surpassing ancient authority is aptly illustrated on the frontispiece of the 1620 volume containing the New Organon by a ship boldly sailing beyond the mythical pillars of Hercules, which supposedly marked the end of the known world.)
The New Organon is presented not in the form of a treatise or methodical demonstration but as a series of aphorisms, a technique that Bacon came to favor as less legislative and dogmatic and more in the true spirit of scientific experiment and critical inquiry. Combined with his gift for illustrative metaphor and symbol, the aphoristic style makes the New Organon in many places the most readable and literary of all Bacon’s scientific and philosophical works.
In Book I of the New Organon (Aphorisms 39-68), Bacon introduces his famous doctrine of the “idols.” These are characteristic errors, natural tendencies, or defects that beset the mind and prevent it from achieving a full and accurate understanding of nature. Bacon points out that recognizing and counteracting the idols is as important to the study of nature as the recognition and refutation of bad arguments is to logic. Incidentally, he uses the word “idol” – from the Greek eidolon (“image” or “phantom”) – not in the sense of a false god or heathen deity but rather in the sense employed in Epicurean physics. Thus a Baconian idol is a potential deception or source of misunderstanding, especially one that clouds or confuses our knowledge of external reality.
Bacon identifies four different classes of idol. Each arises from a different source, and each presents its own special hazards and difficulties.
1. The Idols of the Tribe.
These are the natural weaknesses and tendencies common to human nature. Because they are innate, they cannot be completely eliminated, but only recognized and compensated for. Some of Bacon’s examples are:
- Our senses – which are inherently dull and easily deceivable. (Which is why Bacon prescribes instruments and strict investigative methods to correct them.)
- Our tendency to discern (or even impose) more order in phenomena than is actually there. As Bacon points out, we are apt to find similitude where there is actually singularity, regularity where there is actually randomness, etc.
- Our tendency towards “wishful thinking.” According to Bacon, we have a natural inclination to accept, believe, and even prove what we would prefer to be true.
- Our tendency to rush to conclusions and make premature judgments (instead of gradually and painstakingly accumulating evidence).
2. The Idols of the Cave.
Unlike the idols of the tribe, which are common to all human beings, those of the cave vary from individual to individual. They arise, that is to say, not from nature but from culture and thus reflect the peculiar distortions, prejudices, and beliefs that we are all subject to owing to our different family backgrounds, childhood experiences, education, training, gender, religion, social class, etc. Examples include:
- Special allegiance to a particular discipline or theory.
- High esteem for a few select authorities.
- A “cookie-cutter” mentality – that is, a tendency to reduce or confine phenomena within the terms of our own narrow training or discipline.
3. The Idols of the Market Place.
These are hindrances to clear thinking that arise, Bacon says, from the “intercourse and association of men with each other.” The main culprit here is language, though not just common speech, but also (and perhaps particularly) the special discourses, vocabularies, and jargons of various academic communities and disciplines. He points out that “the idols imposed by words on the understanding are of two kinds”: “they are either names of things that do not exist” (e.g., the crystalline spheres of Aristotelian cosmology) or faulty, vague, or misleading names for things that do exist (according to Bacon, abstract qualities and value terms – e.g., “moist,” “useful,” etc. – can be a particular source of confusion).
4. The Idols of the Theatre.
Like the idols of the cave, those of the theatre are culturally acquired rather than innate. And although the metaphor of a theatre suggests an artificial imitation of truth, as in drama or fiction, Bacon makes it clear that these idols derive mainly from grand schemes or systems of philosophy – and especially from three particular types of philosophy:
- Sophistical Philosophy – that is, philosophical systems based only on a few casually observed instances (or on no experimental evidence at all) and thus constructed mainly out of abstract argument and speculation. Bacon cites Scholasticism as a conspicuous example.
- Empirical Philosophy – that is, a philosophical system ultimately based on a single key insight (or on a very narrow base of research), which is then erected into a model or paradigm to explain phenomena of all kinds. Bacon cites the example of William Gilbert, whose experiments with the lodestone persuaded him that magnetism operated as the hidden force behind virtually all earthly phenomena.
- Superstitious Philosophy – this is Bacon’s phrase for any system of thought that mixes theology and philosophy. He cites Pythagoras and Plato as guilty of this practice, but also points his finger at pious contemporary efforts, similar to those of Creationists today, to found systems of natural philosophy on Genesis or the book of Job.
At the beginning of the Magna Instauratio and in Book II of the New Organon, Bacon introduces his system of “true and perfect Induction,” which he proposes as the essential foundation of scientific method and a necessary tool for the proper interpretation of nature. (This system was to have been more fully explained and demonstrated in Part IV of the Instauratio in a section titled “The Ladder of the Intellect,” but unfortunately the work never got beyond an introduction.)
According to Bacon, his system differs not only from the deductive logic and mania for syllogisms of the Schoolmen, but also from the classic induction of Aristotle and other logicians. As Bacon explains it, classic induction proceeds “at once from . . . sense and particulars up to the most general propositions” and then works backward (via deduction) to arrive at intermediate propositions. Thus, for example, from a few observations one might conclude (via induction) that “all new cars are shiny.” One would then be entitled to proceed backward from this general axiom to deduce such middle-level axioms as “all new Lexuses are shiny,” “all new Jeeps are shiny,” etc. – axioms that presumably would not need to be verified empirically since their truth would be logically guaranteed as long as the original generalization (“all new cars are shiny”) is true.
As Bacon rightly points out, one problem with this procedure is that if the general axioms prove false, all the intermediate axioms may be false as well. All it takes is one contradictory instance (in this case one new car with a dull finish) and “the whole edifice tumbles.” For this reason Bacon prescribes a different path. His method is to proceed “regularly and gradually from one axiom to another, so that the most general are not reached till the last.” In other words, each axiom – i.e., each step up “the ladder of intellect” – is thoroughly tested by observation and experimentation before the next step is taken. In effect, each confirmed axiom becomes a foothold to a higher truth, with the most general axioms representing the last stage of the process.
Thus, in the example described, the Baconian investigator would be obliged to examine a full inventory of new Chevrolets, Lexuses, Jeeps, etc., before reaching any conclusions about new cars in general. And while Bacon admits that such a method can be laborious, he argues that it eventually produces a stable edifice of knowledge instead of a rickety structure that collapses with the appearance of a single disconfirming instance. (Indeed, according to Bacon, when one follows his inductive procedure, a negative instance actually becomes something to be welcomed rather than feared. For instead of threatening an entire assembly, the discovery of a false generalization actually saves the investigator the trouble of having to proceed further in a particular direction or line of inquiry. Meanwhile the structure of truth that he has already built remains intact.)
Is Bacon’s system, then, a sound and reliable procedure, a strong ladder leading from carefully observed particulars to true and “inevitable” conclusions? Although he himself firmly believed in the utility and overall superiority of his method, many of his commentators and critics have had doubts. For one thing, it is not clear that the Baconian procedure, taken by itself, leads conclusively to any general propositions, much less to scientific principles or theoretical statements that we can accept as universally true. For at what point is the Baconian investigator willing to make the leap from observed particulars to abstract generalizations? After a dozen instances? A thousand? The fact is, Bacon’s method provides nothing to guide the investigator in this determination other than sheer instinct or professional judgment, and thus the tendency is for the investigation of particulars – the steady observation and collection of data – to go on continuously, and in effect endlessly.
One can thus easily imagine a scenario in which the piling up of instances becomes not just the initial stage in a process, but the very essence of the process itself; in effect, a zealous foraging after facts (in the New Organon Bacon famously compares the ideal Baconian researcher to a busy bee) becomes not only a means to knowledge, but an activity vigorously pursued for its own sake. Every scientist and academic person knows how tempting it is to put off the hard work of imaginative thinking in order to continue doing some form of rote research. Every investigator knows how easy it is to become wrapped up in data – with the unhappy result that one’s intended ascent up the Baconian ladder gets stuck in mundane matters of fact and never quite gets off the ground.
It was no doubt considerations like these that prompted the English physician (and neo-Aristotelian) William Harvey, of circulation-of-the-blood fame, to quip that Bacon wrote of natural philosophy “like a Lord Chancellor” – indeed like a politician or legislator rather than a practitioner. The assessment is just to the extent that Bacon in the New Organon does indeed prescribe a new and extremely rigid procedure for the investigation of nature rather than describe the more or less instinctive and improvisational – and by no means exclusively empirical – method that Kepler, Galileo, Harvey himself, and other working scientists were actually employing. In fact, other than Tycho Brahe, the Danish astronomer who, overseeing a team of assistants, faithfully observed and then painstakingly recorded entire volumes of astronomical data in tidy, systematically arranged tables, it is doubtful that there is another major figure in the history of science who can be legitimately termed an authentic, true-blooded Baconian. (Darwin, it is true, claimed that The Origin of Species was based on “Baconian principles.” However, it is one thing to collect instances in order to compare species and show a relationship among them; it is quite another to theorize a mechanism, namely evolution by mutation and natural selection, that elegantly and powerfully explains their entire history and variety.)
Science, that is to say, does not, and has probably never advanced according to the strict, gradual, ever-plodding method of Baconian observation and induction. It proceeds instead by unpredictable – and often intuitive and even (though Bacon would cringe at the word) imaginative – leaps and bounds. Kepler used Tycho’s scrupulously gathered data to support his own heart-felt and even occult belief that the movements of celestial bodies are regular and symmetrical, composing a true harmony of the spheres. Galileo tossed unequal weights from the Leaning Tower as a mere public demonstration of the fact (contrary to Aristotle) that they would fall at the same rate. He had long before satisfied himself that this would happen via the very un-Bacon-like method of mathematical reasoning and deductive thought-experiment. Harvey, by a similar process of quantitative analysis and deductive logic, knew that the blood must circulate, and it was only to provide proof of this fact that he set himself the secondary task of amassing empirical evidence and establishing the actual method by which it did so.
One could enumerate – in true Baconian fashion – a host of further instances. But the point is already made: advances in scientific knowledge have not been achieved for the most part via Baconian induction (which amounts to a kind of systematic and exhaustive survey of nature supposedly leading to ultimate insights) but rather by shrewd hints and guesses – in a word by hypotheses – that are then either corroborated or (in Karl Popper’s important term) falsified by subsequent research.
In summary, then, it can be said that Bacon underestimated the role of imagination and hypothesis (and overestimated the value of minute observation and bee-like data collection) in the production of new scientific knowledge. And in this respect it is true that he wrote of science like a Lord Chancellor, regally proclaiming the benefits of his own new and supposedly foolproof technique instead of recognizing and adapting procedures that had already been tested and approved. On the other hand, it must be added that Bacon did not present himself (or his method) as the final authority on the investigation of nature or, for that matter, on any other topic or issue relating to the advance of knowledge. By his own admission, he was but the Buccinator, or “trumpeter,” of such a revolutionary advance – not the founder or builder of a vast new system, but only the herald or announcing messenger of a new world to come.
If anyone deserves the title “universal genius” or “Renaissance man” (accolades traditionally reserved for those who make significant, original contributions to more than one professional discipline or area of learning), Bacon clearly merits the designation. Like Leonardo and Goethe, he produced important work in both the arts and sciences. Like Cicero, Marcus Aurelius, Benjamin Franklin, and Thomas Jefferson, he combined wide and ample intellectual and literary interests (from practical rhetoric and the study of nature to moral philosophy and educational reform) with a substantial political career. Like his near contemporary Machiavelli, he excelled in a variety of literary genres – from learned treatises to light entertainments – though, also like the great Florentine writer, he thought of himself mainly as a political statesman and practical visionary: a man whose primary goal was less to obtain literary laurels for himself than to mold the agendas and guide the policy decisions of powerful nobles and heads of state.
In our own era Bacon would be acclaimed as a “public intellectual,” though his personal record of service and authorship would certainly dwarf the achievements of most academic and political leaders today. Like nearly all public figures, he was controversial. His chaplain and first biographer William Rawley declared him “the glory of his age and nation” and portrayed him as an angel of enlightenment and social vision. His admirers in the Royal Society (an organization that traced its own inspiration and lineage to the Lord Chancellor’s writings) viewed him as nothing less than the daring originator of a new intellectual era. The poet Abraham Cowley called him a “Moses” and portrayed him as an exalted leader who virtually all by himself had set learning on a bold, firm, and entirely new path:
Bacon at last, a mighty Man, arose
Whom a wise King and Nature chose
Lord Chancellour of both their Lawes. . . .
The barren Wilderness he past,
Did on the very Border stand
Of the great promis’d Land,
And from the Mountains Top of his Exalted Wit,
Saw it himself and shew’d us it. . . .
Similarly adulatory if more prosaic assessments were offered by learned contemporaries or near contemporaries from Descartes and Gassendi to Robert Hooke and Robert Boyle. Leibniz was particularly generous and observed that, compared to Bacon’s philosophical range and lofty vision, even a great genius like Descartes “creeps on the ground.” On the other hand, Spinoza, another close contemporary, dismissed Bacon’s work (especially his inductive theories) completely and in effect denied that the supposedly grand philosophical revolution decreed by Bacon, and welcomed by his partisans, had ever occurred.
The response of the later Enlightenment was similarly divided, with a majority of thinkers lavishly praising Bacon while a dissenting minority castigated or even ridiculed him. The French encyclopedists Jean d’Alembert and Denis Diderot sounded the keynote of this 18th-century re-assessment, essentially hailing Bacon as a founding father of the modern era and emblazoning his name on the front page of the Encyclopedia. In a similar gesture, Kant dedicated his Critique of Pure Reason to Bacon and likewise saluted him as an early architect of modernity. Hegel, on the other hand, took a dimmer view. In his “Lectures on the History of Philosophy” he congratulated Bacon on his worldly sophistication and shrewdness of mind, but ultimately judged him to be a person of depraved character and a mere “coiner of mottoes.” In his view, the Lord Chancellor was a decidedly low-minded (read typically English and utilitarian) philosopher whose instruction was fit mainly for “civil servants and shopkeepers.”
Probably the fullest and most perceptive Enlightenment account of Bacon’s achievement and place in history was Voltaire’s laudatory essay in his Letters on the English. After referring to Bacon as the father of experimental philosophy, he went on to assess his literary merits, judging him to be an elegant, instructive, and witty writer, though too much given to “fustian.”
Bacon’s reputation and legacy remain controversial even today. While no historian of science or philosophy doubts his immense importance both as a proselytizer on behalf of the empirical method and as an advocate of sweeping intellectual reform, opinion varies widely as to the actual social value and moral significance of the ideas that he represented and effectively bequeathed to us. The issue basically comes down to one’s estimate of or sympathy for the entire Enlightenment/Utilitarian project. Those who for the most part share Bacon’s view that nature exists mainly for human use and benefit, and who furthermore endorse his opinion that scientific inquiry should aim first and foremost at the amelioration of the human condition and the “relief of man’s estate,” generally applaud him as a great social visionary. On the other hand, those who view nature as an entity in its own right, a higher-order estate of which the human community is only a part, tend to perceive him as a kind of arch-villain – the evil originator of the idea of science as the instrument of global imperialism and technological conquest.
On the one side, then, we have figures like the anthropologist and science writer Loren Eiseley, who portrays Bacon (whom he calls “the man who saw through time”) as a kind of Promethean culture hero. He praises Bacon as the great inventor of the idea of science as both a communal enterprise and a practical discipline in the service of humanity. On the other side, we have writers, from Theodor Adorno, Max Horkheimer, and Lewis Mumford to, more recently, Jeremy Rifkin and eco-feminist Carolyn Merchant, who have represented him as one of the main culprits behind what they perceive as western science’s continuing legacy of alienation, exploitation, and ecological oppression.
Clearly somewhere in between this ardent Baconolotry on the one hand and strident demonization of Bacon on the other lies the real Lord Chancellor: a Colossus with feet of clay. He was by no means a great system-builder (indeed his Magna Instauratio turned out to be less of a “grand edifice” than a magnificent heap) but rather, as he more modestly portrayed himself, a great spokesman for the reform of learning and a champion of modern science. In the end we can say that he was one of the giant figures of intellectual history – and as brilliant, and flawed, a philosopher as he was a statesman.
Note: The standard edition of Bacon’s Works and Letters and Life is still that of James Spedding, et. al., (14 volumes, London, 1857- 1874), also available in a facsimile reprint (Stuttgart, 1989).
- Adorno, Theodor and Max Horkheimer. The Dialectic of Enlightenment. 1944.
- Anderson, F. H. Francis Bacon: His Career and His Thought. Los Angeles: University of Southern California Press, 1962.
- Bury, J.B. The Idea of Progress. London: MacMillan, 1920.
- Eiseley, Loren. The Man Who Saw Through Time. New York: Scribners, 1973.
- Fish, Stanley E. “The Experience of Bacon’s Essays.” In Self-Consuming Artifacts. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1972.
- Gaukroger, Stephen. Francis Bacon and the Transformation of Early-modern Philosophy. Cambridge, U.K. ; New York : Cambridge University Press, 2001.
- Merchant, Carolyn. The Death of Nature: Women, Ecology, and the Scientific Revolution. San Francisco: Harper and Row, 1980.
- Mumford, Lewis. Technics and Civilization. 1934.
- Lampert, Laurence. Nietzsche and Modern Times : A Study of Bacon, Descartes, and Nietzsche. New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press, 1993.
- Rifkin, Jeremy. Biosphere Politics. New York: Crown, 1991.
- Rossi, Paolo. Francis Bacon: from Magic to Science. Trans. Sacha Rabinovitch. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1968.
- Vickers, Brian. Francis Bacon. Harlow, UK: Longman Group, 1978.
- Vickers, Brian, Ed. Francis Bacon. New York : Oxford University Press, 1996.
- Whitney, Charles. Francis Bacon and Modernity. New Haven, CN: Yale University Press, 1986.
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