The Bakhtin Circle was a 20th century school of Russian thought which centered on the work of Mikhail Mikhailovich Bakhtin (1895-1975). The circle addressed philosophically the social and cultural issues posed by the Russian Revolution and its degeneration into the Stalin dictatorship. Their work focused on the centrality of questions of significance in social life in general and artistic creation in particular, examining the way in which language registered the conflicts between social groups. The key views of the circle are that linguistic production is essentially dialogic, formed in the process of social interaction, and that this leads to the interaction of different social values being registered in terms of reaccentuation of the speech of others. While the ruling stratum tries to posit a single discourse as exemplary, the subordinate classes are inclined to subvert this monologic closure. In the sphere of literature, poetry and epics represent the centripetal forces within the cultural arena whereas the novel is the structurally elaborated expression of popular ideologiekritik, the radical criticism of society. Members of the circle included Matvei Isaevich Kagan (1889-1937); Pavel Nikolaevich Medvedev (1891-1938); Lev Vasilievich Pumpianskii (1891-1940); Ivan Ivanovich Sollertinskii (1902-1944); Valentin Nikolaevich Voloshinov (1895-1936); and others.
M.M. Bakhtin and his circle began meeting in the Belorussian towns of Nevel and Vitebsk in 1918 before moving to Leningrad in 1924. Their group meetings were terminated due to the arrest of many of the group in 1929. From this time until his death in 1975, Bakhtin continued to work on the topics which had occupied his group, living in internal exile first in Kustanai (Kazakhstan, 1930-36), Savelovo (about 100 km from Moscow, 1937-45), Saransk (Mordovia, 1936-7, 1945-69) and finally moving in 1969 to Moscow, where he died at the age of eighty. In Saransk Bakhtin worked at the Mordov Pedagogical Institute (now University) until retirement in 1961.
The Bakhtin circle is reputed to have been initiated by Kagan on his return from Germany, where he had studied philosophy in Leipzig, Berlin and Marburg. He had been a pupil of the founder of Marburg Neo-Kantianism Herman Cohen and had attended lectures by Ernst Cassirer. Kagan established a “Kantian Seminar” at which various philosophical, religious and cultural issues were discussed. Kagan was a Jewish intellectual who had been a member of the Social Democratic Party (the precursor of the Bolsheviks and Mensheviks) and he may have been attracted to Cohen’s philosophy for its supposed affinity with Marxism (Cohen regarded his ethical philosophy as completely compatible with that of Marx), while rejecting the atheism of Russian Communism. Whatever the truth of the matter, the members of the circle did not restrict themselves to academic philosophy but became closely involved in the radical cultural activities of the time, activities which became more intense with the movement of the group to Vitebsk, where many important avant-garde artists such as Malevich and Chagall had settled to avoid the privations of the Civil War. One of the group, Pavel Medvedev, a graduate in law from Petrograd University, became rector of the Vitebsk Proletarian University, editing the town’s cultural journalIskusstvo (Art) to which he and Voloshinov contributed articles, while Bakhtin and Pumpianskii both gave public lectures on a variety of philosophical and cultural topics, as seen in recently published student notes. Pumpianskii, it is known, never finished his studies at Petrograd university, while it is doubtful whether Bakhtin had any formal higher education at all despite his claims, now disproven, to have graduated from the same University in 1918. It seems that Bakhtin attempted to gain acceptance in academic circles by adopting aspects of his older brother’s biography. Nikolai Bakhtin had a solid classical education from his German governess and graduated from Petrograd University, where he had been a pupil of the renowned classicist F.F. Zelinskii. Bakhtin had therefore been exposed to philosophical ideas since his youth. After Nikolai’s departure for the Crimea, and Mikhail’s move to Nevel, it seems that Kagan took the place of his brother as unofficial mentor, having an important influence on Bakhtin’s philosophy in a new and exciting cultural environment, although the two friends went their separate ways in 1921, the year Bakhtin married.
Kagan, however, moved to take up a teaching position at the newly established provincial university in Orel in 1921. While there he published the only sustained piece of philosophy to be published by a member of the group before the late 1920s entitled “Kak vozmozhna istoria” (How Is History Possible) in 1922. The same year he produced an obituary of Hermann Cohen in which he stressed the historical and sociological aspects of Cohen’s philosophy and wrote other unpublished works. 1922 also saw the publication of Pumpianskii’s paper “Dostoevskii i antichnost´” (Dostoyevsky and Antiquity), a theme that was to recur in Bakhtin’s work for many years. While Bakhtin himself did not publish any substantial work until 1929, he was clearly working on matters related to Neo-Kantian philosophy and the problem of authorship at this time. Bakhtin’s earliest published work is the two page “Iskusstvo i otvetstvennost´” (Art and Answerability) from 1919 and fragments of a larger project on moral philosophy written between 1920 and 1924, now usually referred to as K filosofii postupka (Towards a Philosophy of the Act).
Most of the group’s significant work was produced after their move to Leningrad in 1924. It seems that there the group became acutely aware of the challenge posed by Saussurean linguistics and its development in the work of the Formalists. Thus there emerges a new awareness of the importance of the philosophy of language in philosophy and poetics. The most significant work on the philosophy of language was published in the period 1926-1930 by Voloshinov: a series of articles and a book entitledMarksizm i filosofia iazyka (Marxism and the Philosophy of Language) (1929). Medvedev, who had been put in charge of the archive of the symbolist poet Aleksandr Blok, participated in the vigorous discussions between Marxist and formalist literary theorists with a series of articles and a book, Formal´lnyi metod v literaturovedenii (The Formal Method in Literary Scholarship) (1928) and the first book-length study of Blok’s work. Voloshinov also published an article and a book (1925, 1926) on the debate which raged around Freudianism at the time. In 1929 Bakhtin produced the first edition of his famous monograph Problemy tvorchestva Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky’s Work), but many other works dating from 1924-9 remained unpublished and usually unfinished. Among these was a critical essay on formalism called “Problema soderzheniia i formy v slovesnom khudozhestvennom tvorchestve” (The Problem of Content, Material and Form in Verbal Artistic Creation) (1924) and a book length study called “Avtor i geroi v esteticheskoi deiatel´nosti” (Author and Hero in Aesthetic Activity) (1924-7).
Since the 1970s the works published under the names of Voloshinov and Medvedev have often been ascribed to Bakhtin, who neither consented nor objected. A voluminous, ideologically motivated, often bad-tempered and largely futile body of literature has grown up to contest the issue one way or another, but since there is no concrete evidence to suggest that the published authors were not responsible for the texts which bear their names, there seems no real case to answer. It seems much more likely that the materials were written as a result of lively group discussions around these issues, which group members wrote up according to their own perspectives afterwards. There are clearly many philosophical, ideological and stylistic discrepancies which, despite the presence of certain parallels and points of agreement, suggest these very different works were largely the work of different authors. In accordance with Bakhtin’s own philosophy, it seems logical to treat them as rejoinders in ongoing dialogues between group members on the one hand and between the group and other contemporary thinkers on the other.
The sharp deterioration in the situation of unorthodox intellectuals in the Soviet Union at the end of 1928 effectively broke the Bakhtin circle up. Bakhtin, whose health had already begun to deteriorate, was arrested, presumably because of his connection with the St. Petersburg Religious-Philosophical society, and was sentenced to ten years on the Solovetskii Islands. After vigorous intercession by Bakhtin’s friends, a favourable review of his Dostoyevsky book by Commissar of Enlightenment Lunacharskii and a personal appeal by Maksim Gor´kii, this was commuted to six years exile in Kazakhstan. With the tightening of censorship at the time, very little was published by Voloshinov, while Medvedev published a book on theories of authorship V laboratorii pisatelia (In the Laboratory of the Writer) in 1933 and a new version of the Formalism study, revised to fit in more closely with the ideological requirements of the time, in 1934. Medvedev was appointed full professor at the Leningrad Historico-Philological Institute but was arrested and disappeared during the terror of 1938. Voloshinov worked at the Herzen Pedagogical Institute in Leningrad until 1934 when he contracted tuberculosis. He died in a sanitorium two year later leaving unfinished a translation of the first volume of Ernst Cassirer’s The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, a book which is of considerable importance in the work of the circle. Kagan died of angina in 1937 after working as editor of an encyclopedic atlas of energy resources in the Soviet Union for many years. Pumpianskii pursued a successful career as Professor of Literature at Leningrad University, but published only short articles and introductions to works of Russian authors, most notably Turgenev. Sollertinskii joined the Leningrad Philharmonic in 1927 as a lecturer, but soon established himself as one of the leading Soviet musicologists, producing over two hundred articles, books and reviews. He died of a heart attack, probably resulting from the privations of the Leningrad blockade, in 1944.
While in Kazakhstan Bakhtin began work on his now famous theory of the novel which resulted in the now famous articles Slovo v romane (Discourse in the Novel) (1934-5), Iz predystorii romannogo slovo (From the Prehistory of Novelistic Discourse) (1940), Epos i roman (Epic and Novel) (1941),Formy vremeni i khronotopa v romane (Forms of Time and Chronotope in the Novel) (1937-8). Between 1936 and 1938 he completed a book on the Bildungsroman and its significance in the history of realism which was lost when the publishing house at which the manuscript was lying awaiting publication was destroyed in the early days of the German invasion of the Soviet Union in 1941. Voluminous, most still unpublished, preparatory material still exists, although part is lost, allegedly because Bakhtin used it for cigarette papers during the wartime paper shortage. Bakhtin’s exceptional productiveness at this time is further accentuated when one considers that one of his legs was amputated in February 1938. He had suffered from inflammation of the bone marrow, osteomyelitis, for many years, which gave him a lot of pain, high temperatures, and often confined him to bed for weeks on end. This had been a factor in the appeals of his friends and acquaintances for clemency when he was internally exiled, a factor that may well have saved his life. This did not, however, prevent him from presenting a now famous doctoral thesis on Rabelais to the Gor´kii Institute of World Literature in 1940. The work proved extremely controversial in the hostile ideological climate of the time and it was not until 1951 that Bakhtin was eventually granted the qualification of kandidat. It was not published in book form until 1965.
The period between the completion of the Rabelais study and the second edition of the Dostoyevsky study in 1963 is perhaps the least well known of Bakhtin’s life in terms of work produced. This has been recently (1996) rectified with the publication of archival materials from this period, when Bakhtin was working as a lecturer at the Mordov Pedagogical Institute. The most substantial work dating from this period is Problema rechevykh zhanrov (The Problem of Speech Genres) which was most likely produced in response to the reorganisation of Soviet linguistics in the wake of Stalin’s article Marksizm i voprosy iazykoznaniia (Marxism and Questions of Linguistics) of 1953. Many other fragments exist from this time, including notes for a planned article about Maiakovskii and more methodological comments on the study of the novel.
In the more liberal atmosphere of the so-called “thaw” following Khruschev’s accession, Bakhtin’s work on Dostoyevsky came to the attention of a group of younger scholars led by Vadim Kozhinov who, upon finding out that he was still alive, contacted Bakhtin and tried to convince him to republish the 1929 Dostoyevsky book. After some initial hesitation, Bakhtin responded by significantly expanding and fundamentally altering the overall project. It was accepted for publication in September 1963 and received a generally favourable reception. Publication of the Rabelais study, newly edited for purposes of acceptability (mainly the toning down of scatology and an analysis of a speech by Lenin) followed soon after. As Bakhtin’s health continued to decline, he was taken to hospital in Moscow in 1969 and in May 1970 he and his wife, who died a year later, were moved into a retirement home just outside Moscow. Bakhtin continued to work until just before his death in 1975, producing work of a mainly methodological character.
Since Bakhtin’s death, several collections of his work have appeared in Russian and many translations have followed. English language translations have been appearing since 1968, although the quality of translation and systematicity of publication has been uneven. Up to ten different translators have published work by a writer whose terminology is very specific, often rendering key concepts in a variety of different ways. This has exacerbated problems of interpretation and questions of theoretical heritage, especially since there is a quite sharp distinction between works written before and after the 1929 Dostoyevsky study. Another problem has been the questions of authorship of the Bakhtin circle and the extent to which a Marxist vocabulary in the works of Voloshinov and Medvedev should be taken at face value. Those, for example, who argue Bakhtin was the author of these works also tend to argue that the vocabulary is mere “window dressing” to facilitate publication, while those who support the authenticity of the original publications also tend to take the Marxist arguments seriously. As a result writers about Bakhtin have tended to choose one period of Bakhtin’s career and treat it as definitive, a practice which has produced a variety of divergent versions of “Bakhtinian” thought. The recent appearance of the first volume of a collected works in Russian might help to overcome the problems which have dogged Bakhtin studies.
The work of the Bakhtin Circle should be regarded as a philosophy of culture. Questions which seem to be of very specific relevance, such as the modality of author-hero relations, actually involve questions of a much more general nature encompassing the value-laden relations between subject and object, subjects and other subjects. The phenomenological arguments presented by the young Bakhtin are directed against the abstractions of rationalist philosophy and contemporary positivism. He draws much of his conceptual structure from the work of the Marburg School (most notably Hermann Cohen (1842-1918), Paul Natorp (1854-1924) and Nicolai Hartmann (1882-1950)) and German phenomenologists such as Max Scheler (1874-1928) and Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936). However, it is particularly difficult to trace the precise influence of these writers because Bakhtin was notoriously inconsistent in crediting his sources and was not averse to copying whole passages which he had translated from German into Russian in his works without reference to the original. This has led many commentators either to guess at influences on the young Bakhtin or to credit him with the invention of a philosophical vocabulary almost from nothing. However, recent archival work by Brian Poole has uncovered notebooks in which Bakhtin made copious notes from various German idealist philosophers which give us a better idea both of the sources of his ideas and the originality of the philosophical work which resulted from his fusion of disparate ideas.
The ideas of the Marburg School were undoubtedly filtered to Bakhtin through the works of Matvei Kagan on his return from Germany at the end of the First World War. In his obituary of Cohen Kagan stressed the religious, messianic aspects of the former’s philosophy, which emerges in his later work. For the late Cohen, “the unity of objective being, as an unending large process of the unity of being and concept demands the unending small unity of the singular individuum…. The whole problem of religion is contained in the problem of the individuum as in the question of God.” The continual relationship between the individuum and God is the absolute element of subjectivity and is the unity of monotheism. The individual does not combine with God but continually relates to God. This has social significance, for religion grows out of ethics: “the religion of the unity of humanity is monotheism…. Religion is everywhere, in all regions of culture…. Religion itself is philosophy.” Problems of intersubjectivity must be related to questions of historical development: “in our opinion, the problem of individual relationships, the problem of subjective consciousness, ontological subjectivity can be based on the pathos of the individual condition of the struggle of the historical life of culture, the person and humanity.” Kagan stresses the parallels between Cohen’s ethics and the traditions of Russian populism, a factor which recurs later in Bakhtin’s career when the novel becomes linked with a populist political process. (M. Kagan, German Kogen, 1922) The unity of the individual is dependent on the unity of the people and this is in turn dependent on the unity of God.
Whatever the difficulties of tracing his more immediate precursors, there is no doubt that Bakhtin’s philosophical project maintained a fundamental connection with the traditions of Enlightenment aesthetics and with Kantianism in particular. As for Kant, the aesthetic is distinguished by its “disinterestedness,” the uncoupling of purposiveness from representation of the end. Where Kant concentrated on aesthetic judgement, however, Bakhtin was interested in aesthetic activity which can help to establish a mode of reciprocal intersubjective relationships necessary to produce an intimate unity of individuals whose specificity is in no way endangered. This project, which remains constant throughout his work, adopts various forms. The aesthetic is the realm where now detached from the “open event of being” and “finalized” by virtue of the author’s “exteriority” (vnenakhodimost´), the value-laden essence of the hero’s deed is manifested. If the hero’s activity were not objectified by the author then he or she would remain in some perpetual stream of consciousness, completely oblivious to the wider significance of those deeds. However, in order to visualise the meaningful nature of those deeds, the author must also have an insight into the subjective world of the hero, his or her horizon, sphere of views and interests (krugozor). Only the appropriate mode of empathy and objectification can produce the sort of productive whole Bakhtin envisages.
Several problems arise from this model. The first is that Bakhtin seems to want to use the author-hero model as a reciprocal principle within society and as a model of relations in literary composition. In the first model authors and heroes change their roles constantly, the unique perspective of each subject allows the objectification of others except oneself, who is objectified by others. Although the concept hardly appears in the early works, from 1928 onwards dialogue becomes the model of such interactions: one gains an awareness of one’s own place within the whole through dialogue, which helps to bestow an awareness on others at the same time. This is a very pleasant model as long as relationships remain equal. Yet the author-hero model also assumes a fundamental inequality in that the hero of a work can never have a reciprocal vantage point from which to objectify the author and thus the creator. There is a crucial difference between a person-to-person and a person-to-God relationship which Bakhtin’s model seems to obscure.
Furthermore, Bakhtin’s model of the unique perspective of each author/hero, which is drawn from the Kantian model of an individual consciousness bearing a-priori categories encountering and giving form to the manifold of sense impressions, is seriously compromised when one admits a socio-linguistic dimension into the equation. This happens in Voloshinov’s 1926 article on discourse in life and poetry. The alternative adopted by Voloshinov foregrounds the intonational dimension of language which manifests the unique evaluative connections between subject and object. Language enmeshed within everyday practical activity is extracted, or liberated, from its connection with the “open event of being” by the author who then reflects upon it, from his or her own unique vantage point, manifesting its total intonational meaning. The hero’s language is alien to the author and therefore ripe for objectification; the crucial category is the latter’s exteriority. Stress on this intonational dimension allows the encounter of the two consciousnesses to be spoken about in phenomenological rather than linguistic terms and therefore allows Bakhtin to counter what he calls “theoreticism”, the tendency to consider the inner meaning of an action and its historical specificity in isolation from each other. This might include Hegel‘s tendency to view the particular incident as meaningful only as an instance of the unfolding of reason, Husserl‘s sublation of inter-subjective relations in transcendental subjectivity or the positivistic assumption that categorisation of a phenomenon is sufficient to explain that phenomenon.
The distinctively Bakhtinian approach to language only really begins to emerge in Voloshinov’s 1926 essay Slovo v zhizni i slovo v poezii: k voprosam sotsiologicheskoi poetiki (Discourse in Life and Discourse in Poetry: Questions of Sociological Poetics), written during his postgraduate studies at the Institute of Material, Artistic and Verbal Culture in Leningrad where L.P. Iakubinskii, the pioneer of the study of dialogic speech, was among his advisers. This work, which has been seen as the earliest example of pragmatics by more than one commentator, is the first work of the circle to be presented as an explicitly Marxist text. The author attempts to define the aesthetic as a specific form of social interaction characterised by its “completion by the creation of the artistic work and by its continual recreations in cocreative perception and it does not require any other objectifications”. In the artistic work unspoken social evaluations are “condensed” and determine artistic form. The deeper structural features of a particular social interaction are made manifest in a successful artistic work; as Voloshinov puts it, “form should be a convincing evaluation of the content” (Bakhtin School Papers ed. Shukman, Colchester 1983 p.9, 19, 20). The early Bakhtinian phenomenology is now recast in terms of discursive interaction, with a specifically sociological frame of reference.
Another of Voloshinov’s projects was a critical response to incipient psychoanalysis and contemporary attempts to attempt a fusion of Marxism and Freudianism. In 1927 he published his first book calledFreidizm: Kriticheskii ocherk (Freudianism a Critical Sketch), which continued the theme of an earlier article from 1925 Po tu storonu sotsial´nogo (Just Beyond the Social) in which Freud was accused of a biological reductionism and subjectivism quite alien to the spirit of Marxism. Leaning upon a sociological analysis of language and culture, Voloshinov stresses that intersubjectivity precedes subjectivity as such and that all meaning production and thus repression of meanings are socio-ideological rather than individual and biological as Freud supposed. It must be noted, however, that Voloshinov does not pay any attention to Freud’s later work on cultural phenomena and thus presents a rather one-sided view of contemporary psychology. Furthermore, Freudianism is treated as a manifestation of “bourgeois decay” very much in the spirit of the later Lukács. This indicates a turning towards a more Hegelian approach to questions of cultural and philosophical development, while the recasting of the Freudian superego in terms of the repression of unofficial ideologies by an official ideology anticipates one of the central themes that would occupy Bakhtin in the 1930s and 1940s.
In the late 1920s the sociological and linguistic turn signalled by Voloshinov’s article on discourse had begun to form into a distinct school of thought in which language was the index of social relations and embodiment of ideological worldview. While Voloshinov’s linguistic studies were undoubtedly crucial to this reorientation, one of the central influences on the group at the time was the work of Ernst Cassirer, whose ground-breaking Philosophy of Symbolic Forms (3 Vols) was published between 1923 and 1929. One of Voloshinov’s unfinished projects, which he began while at University, was a translation of the first volume of Cassirer’s work on language. This volume marked the culmination of Cassirer’s move away from Marburg Neo-Kantianism to a Hegelian rectification of Kant. Adopting Hegel’s dialectical orientation, evolutionary approach to human knowledge and existence and concentration of the totality of human activities, Cassirer sought to overcome the exclusivity of the Kantian focus on mankind’s rational thought processes. At the same time, however, Cassirer strove to resist the Hegelian subsumption of all realms of the human spirit into the Absolute by retaining the Kantian distinction between the “languages” of the human spirit. To this end Cassirer drew upon Herder and von Humboldt’s identification of thought and signification, viewing the “symbolic function” as the common element to all areas of knowledge, but which took a specific form in each of them. The truth, agreed Cassirer and Hegel, is whole, but the former understood this to mean that each of the perspectives offered by various symbolic forms is equally valid and must be progressively “unfolded” so as to fully articulate itself. This formulation, as we shall see, had a far reaching effect on the later work of Bakhtin, but there are signs of its influence almost immediately in the work of the group.
In 1928 P.N. Medvedev published a book-length critique of Russian Formalism. This work begins with a definition of literary scholarship as “one branch of the study of ideologies”, a study which “embraces all areas of man’s ideological creativity”. Medvedev goes on to argue that while Marxism has established the basis of such a study, including its relationship to economic factors, the study of “the distinctive features and qualitative individuality of each of the branches of ideological creation — science, art, ethics, religion, and so forth. — is still in the embryonic stage” (p.3). Despite the replacement of “symbolic forms” with “branches of ideological creation” the continuity of approach is clear. Where Cassirer sought to examine the symbolic function as “a factor which recurs in each basic cultural form but in no two takes exactly the same shape” (vol. 1, p.84), Medvedev sought to investigate the “sociological laws of development” which can be found in each “branch” of “ideological creation” but which manifests itself in specific ways. This sociological adaption of Cassirer’s work was to feature largely in Bakhtin’s work from the 1930s and 1940s, where, as Poole has demonstrated, many unattributed passages from the former’s work appear in Russian translation within the body of the latter’s work. Medvedev felt that the Formalists were correct in attempting to define the specific features of literary creation but fundamentally mistaken in the positivistic approach they took towards literary devices which tended to efface the ideological, meaning-bearing and thus sociological aspect of literary form. In conclusion Medvedev recommended that the formalists be treated respectfully and seriously, even if their fundamental premises were erroneous. Marxist criticism, he argued, should value Formalism as an object of serious criticism through which the bases of the former can be clarified.
While subjecting the Russian Formalists to intense criticism on the basis of their partisan alliance with the Futurist movement and their sharing its tendency towards a nihilistic destruction of meaning, Medvedev particularly praised Western “formalist art scholarship” such as the work of Hildebrand, Wölfflin and Worringer. These theorists were important for the development of the Bakhtin circle because they treated changes of artistic forms and styles as changes of “artistic volition”, that is, having ideological significance. Worringer saw art history to be marked by an alternation of naturalism (empathy) and abstraction (estrangement) which correlated to the harmony or otherwise in the relationship of man and his environment. While formal and evaluative aspects are not identical, they do tend to maintain a close affiliation and this, Medvedev concluded, can be applied to literary form as well as visual art. This particular chapter, along with some shorter extracts of the book were omitted from the second edition of the book published with the title Formalizm I formalisty (Formalism and the Formalists) in 1934. By this time a tolerant attitude towards the Formalists or Western scholarship was not permitted, and thus an additional and extremely hostile chapter called “The Collapse of Formalism” was included. Earlier writers on the Bakhtin Circle tended to ascribe the first edition to Bakhtin and the second to Medvedev, but it is clear that the body of the second edition is an expurgated version of the first.
Medvedev’s formulation was carried over into Bakhtin’s now famous study Problemy tvorchestva Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky’s Work) published in 1929. Here the great nineteenth-century novelist’s own verbally affirmed and often reactionary ideology is downplayed in favour of his “form-shaping ideology” which is seen to be imbued with a profoundly democratic spirit. Bakhtin attacks those critics, such as Engelgardt, who characterised Dostoyevsky’s creative method as Hegelian. In such a scheme two positions struggle for ascendancy but are transformed into a synthesis at the end; however, according to Bakhtin, there is no merging of voices into a final, authoritative voice as in the Hegelian absolute. Dostoyevsky does not present an abstract dialectic but an unmerged dialogue of voices, each given equal rights. Bakhtin follows the nineteenth-century German novelist and critic Otto Ludwig in terming this type of dialogue “polyphonic dialogue”, which allows Cassirer’s insistence on a plurality of cultural forms to be extended to a plurality of discourses in society and the novel. In the course of Dostoyevsky’s novels, argues Bakhtin, very much in the spirit of Cassirer, the worldviews of Dostoyevsky’s heroes “unfold”, presenting their own unique perspective upon the world. The novelist does not, as is the case with Tolstoi, submerge all positions beneath a single authoritative perspective, but allows the voice of the narrator to reside beside the voices of the characters, bestowing no greater authority on that voice than on any of the others. Voices intersect and interact, mutually illuminating their ideological structures, potentialities, biases and limitations.
Bakhtin’s early phenomenology is now translated into discursive terms. Where Bakhtin was initially concerned with intersubjective relations and the modality of authorial and heroic interaction, this is now examined in terms of the way in which one language encounters another, reporting and modifying the utterance by reaccentuating it. Modes of interaction range from stylisation to explicit parody, which Bakhtin spends a considerable proportion of the book cataloguing. As only the later edition of the book (1963) has been published in English, there is a tendency to confuse the chronology of the emergence of Bakhtin’s key concepts. It should be noted that there is no reflection on carnival or on the Menippean Satire in the first edition of the Dostoyevsky study. These features only emerged in the next decade in relation to the history of the novel as a genre. The first edition of the Dostoyevsky study is a monograph on the work of the famous novelist in terms which in many respects embody the poetics of a significant portion of contemporary “fellow-traveller” writing. When considered in its historical context, the Dostoyevsky study can be seen as a sort of rearguard defence of liberality in the cultural arena against the encroachment of political control. The book was published on the eve of the destructive RAPP dictatorship, when bellicose advocates of “proletarian culture” were granted free reign by the newly victorious Stalinist leadership of the Soviet Communist Party. Formal experimentation and an inadequately tendentious narrative position was branded as reactionary, while Bakhtin’s work defended the presentation of a plurality of perspectives free from “monologic” closure. The formal characteristics of a work were themselves of ideological significance, but the reactionary tendency was in the imposition of a unitary perspective on a varied community of opinion.
The semiotic dimension of the new orientation of the Bakhtin Circle was developed at the same time by Voloshinov. In a series of articles between 1928 and 1930 punctuated by the appearance of the book-length Marksizm i filosofiia iazyka (Marxism and the Philosophy of Language) in 1929 (2nd edition 1930) Voloshinov published an analysis of the relationship between language and ideology unsurpassed for several decades. Voloshinov examines two contemporary accounts of language, what he calls “abstract objectivism”, whose leading exponent is Saussure, and “individualistic subjectivism”, developed from the work of Wilhelm von Humboldt by the romantic idealists Benedetto Croce (1866-1952) and Karl Vossler (1872-1942). Voloshinov argues that the two trends derive from rationalism and romanticism respectively and share both the strengths and weaknesses of those movements. While the former identifies the systematic and social character of language it mistakes the “system of self-identical forms” for the source of language usage in society; it abstracts language from the concrete historical context of its utilisation (Bakhtin’s “theoreticism”); the part is examined at the expense of the whole; the individual linguistic element is treated as a “thing” at the expense of the dynamics of speech; a unity of word meaning is assumed to the neglect of the multiplicity of meaning and accent and language is treated as a ready-made system whose developments are aberrations. The latter trend is correct in viewing language as a continuous generative process and asserting that this process is meaningful, but fundamentally wrong in identifying the laws of that creation with those of individual psychology, viewing the generative process as analogous with art and treating the system of signs as an inert crust of the creative process. These partial insights, Voloshinov argues that a stable system of linguistic signs is merely a scientific abstraction; the generative process of language is implemented in the social-verbal interaction of speakers; the laws of language generation are sociological laws; although linguistic and artistic creativity do not coincide, this creativity must be understood in relation to the ideological meanings and values that fill language and that the structure of each concrete utterance is a sociological structure.
Several commentators have noted how Voloshinov’s approach to language anticipates many of the criticisms of linguistic philosophy levelled by present day Poststructuralists, but does so without invoking the relativism of much of the latter or the nullity of Derrida‘s “hors texte.” Voloshinov firmly establishes the sign-bound nature of consciousness and the shifting nature of the language system, but instead of viewing the subject as fragmented by the reality of difference, he poses each utterance to be a microcosm of social conflict. This allows sociological structure and the plurality of discourse to be correlated according to a unitary historical development. In this sense Voloshinov’s critique bears a strong resemblance to the Italian Communist leader Antonio Gramsci’s account of hegemony in his Prison Notebooks. Like Voloshinov and Bakhtin, Gramsci drew upon the work of Croce and Vossler and Matteo Bartoli’s Saussurean “spatial linguistics”, and combined it with a Hegelian reading of Marxism. As we have seen, however, Voloshinov was heavily influenced by the work of Cassirer, whose admiration for the work of von Humboldt, the founder of generative linguistics, was substantial. Voloshinov’s critique thus tended towards the romantic pole of language study rather than taking up the equidistant position he claimed in his study. This can be seen in the tendency to see social groups as collective subjects rather than institutionally defined collectives and such assertions as those which suggest the meaning of a word is “totally determined” by its context. What Voloshinov effectively does is to supplement Humboldt’s recognition of individual and national linguistic variability with a sociological dimension. Humboldt’s “inner-form” of language is recast as the relationality of discourse, dialogism. Abandoning the Marxist distinction between base and superstructure, Voloshinov follows Cassirer and Hegel in seeing the variety of linguistic forms as expressions of a single essence. It is significant that Gramsci, who adopted a consistently pragmatist epistemology followed the same course and emerged with startlingly similar formulations.
This suggests that the relations between the work of the Bakhtin school and Marxism are ones which are complex and worthy of close scrutiny. Those who have tried to set up a Chinese wall between the two tendencies or who have tried to identify them, have consistently failed to do justice to this philosophical dialogue. Some have even gone so far as to see the work of the group as fundamentally anti-Hegelian, a charge which collapses as soon as one traces the use of terminology in the works from the late 1920s.
The shift in Bakhtin’s thought from Kant towards Hegel is nowhere clearer than in his central works on the novel. This can be seen in the new centrality Bakhtin grants to the history of literature to which Kant had been largely indifferent. As if to stress his indebtedness to German idealism, Bakhtin adopts all of the characteristics of the novel as a genre catalogued by Goethe, Schlegel and Hegel with little modification and traces how the “essence” of the genre “appears” over a course of time. The development of the novel is described in a way distinctly reminiscent of Cassirer’s “symbolic forms” which unfold to present their unique view of the world which is itself a modified version of Hegel’s characterisation of thePhenomenology of Spirit as the representation of “appearing knowledge”. At the same time, however, the novel adopts many of the features of the role of Hegel’s philosophy in its Cassireran guise as the philosophy of culture. Such a philosophy, argued Cassirer, does not attempt to go behind the various image worlds created by the human spirit but “to understand and elucidate their basic formative principle” (The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms vol. 1, Language p.113). The novel, according to the scheme developed by Bakhtin, elucidates this principle with regard both to other literary genres and socio-ideological discourses. The old idealist formulation of the novel’s imperative that it be a “full and comprehensive reflection of its era” is reformulated as “the novel must represent all the ideological voices of its era… all the era’s languages that have any claim to being significant” (411). The novel is a symbolic form, but a specific one in which the “basic formative principle” of symbolic forms becomes visible. The socially stratified national language, heteroglossia in itself, becomes heteroglossia for-itself rather as thought perceives itself as its own object at the climax of Hegel’s Phenomenology.
The novel, for Bakhtin, uncovers the formative principle of discourse, its relationality, dialogism, without presenting some final absolute language of truth such as that which constitutes Hegelian conceptualism. The novel develops into something akin to a visio intellectualis of the sort Cassirer found in the work of Nicholas Cusanus. This is a whole which includes all various viewpoints in its accidentiality and necessity, “the thing seen and the manner and direction of the seeing” (Cassirer The Individual and the Cosmos in Renaissance Philosophy 1963, p.32). No individual perspective is adequate to the whole in itself, for only the concrete totality of perspectives can present the whole:
Languages of heteroglossia, like mirrors that face each other, each of which in its own way reflects a little piece, a tiny corner of the world, force us to guess at and grasp behind their inter-reflecting aspects for a world that is broader, more multi-levelled and multi-horizoned than would be available to one language, one mirror. (Bakhtin Voprosy literatury i estetikipp.225-26)
While this aspect of Bakhtin’s theory of the novel is most likely based on the philosophy of Cassirer, who developed his work as a defence of liberal values in the context of an increasingly chauvinistic atmosphere in Weimar Germany, a different political slant becomes markedly more apparent in Bakhtin’s work of the 1930s. The novelist now becomes the heir of an anti-authoritarian popular cultural strategy to deflate the pretensions of the official language and ideology and institute a popular-collective learning process. The antecedent of this strategy is not German bourgeois liberalism but Russian populism (narodnichestvo). Thus the dialectic of mythical and critical symbolic forms which Cassirer outlined in his philosophy now becomes fused with a dialectic of official and popular socio-cultural forces. On one side stand the forces of cultural centralisation and stabilisation: the “official strata”, unitary language, the literary canon and so on. On the other side stands the decentralising influence of popular culture: popular festivity and collective ridicule, literary parody, and the anti-canonic novel. The rise of the novel is correlated with the collapse of antique unity and the breaking down of cultural boundaries. Where the official culture developed a canon of poetic genres which posited a rarified language in opposition to the common spoken language, presented a monolithically serious worldview and epic accounts of a golden age and heroic beginnings, the novel parodies these features, ridiculing the official culture’s claims to universal validity and the ossified conventionality of canonic forms and language.
The novel is thus a literary expression of a whole socio-cultural process, but this process is rather too broad to be incorporated under the label Bakhtin gives to it without considerable problems with regard to conceptual accuracy. The adjective poetic becomes shorthand for the whole complex of institutional and cultural forms which can be included on the side of officialdom. Thus poetic denotes both a type of discourse used in artistic texts and a hierarchical relation between discourses which constitutes the hegemonic relationships of an unequal society. Correspondingly, novelistic describes both the character of a genre, multi-accented artistic discourse, and an anti-authoritarian relationship between discourses. Another pair of terms which is often used interchangeably with these two is monologic and dialogic. The former denotes a mono-accentual type of discourse and an authoritarian stance towards another discourse. The latter describes a multi-accentual discourse, the relationality of discourse, and an orientation on a monologic discourse which seeks to reveal the ideological structure lurking behind surface appearances. The ground between formal and political terms shifts before the reader, who is constantly reminded of the institutional co-ordinates for all discursive phenomena but is never presented with a sociological account of those co-ordinates. This might be explained both by the ideological restrictions placed on any writer in Stalin’s Russia and by the idealist frame of Bakhtin’s own theory. This ambiguity has allowed very different interpretations of Bakhtin’s work to be drawn, ranging from a tendency to reduce the whole argument to one of artistic forms, leading to a liberalistic formal criticism and attempts to correlate Bakhtin’s argument with the institutional forms of modern capitalist society. Bakhtin’s work has thus become a battleground between (mainly American) liberal academics and (mainly British) anti-Stalinist Marxists.
In its classical phase, Russian populism was, according to Walicki, “opposed to the “abstract intellectualism” of those revolutionaries who tried to teach the peasants, to impose on them the ideals of Western socialism, instead of learning what were their real needs and acting in the name of such interests and ideals of which the peasants had already become aware”. Yet it also suggested an opposition to those Second International Marxists who argued that capitalism was an unavoidable stage in the development of Russia (The Controversy Over Capitalism 1989 p.3). In one sense, then, it was a political ideology compatible with Third International Marxism, but in another it sought to reverse the hegemony of intellectuals over “the people”. Bakhtin’s poet is a hegemonic intellectual whose language relates in an authoritative fashion to the discourse of the masses, while the novelist aims to break and indeed reverse that hegemonic relationship. In Bakhtin’s formulation, the locus of critical forces of culture is the people, while the mythological forces of culture emerge from the official stratum.
Many of the central works on the novel were at least partially written in response to the theory of the novel developed by Georg Lukács. Bakhtin had begun to translate Lukács’ Theory of the Novel in the 1920s but abandoned the project upon learning that Lukács no longer liked the book but in the 1930s, when Lukács accommodated to the Stalin regime and essentially became a right Hegelian, his theory of the novel became canonical. Bakhtin agreed with Lukács that the novel represented the “essence of the age” and that irony constituted a central factor of the novelistic method, but rejected the latter’s assertion that unless the novel revealed the thread of rationality running through a seemingly anarchic world, that is, presented an authoritative perspective, the author had succumbed to bourgeois decadence. Modernist formal experimentation and the dominance of parody in modernist literature Lukács found to be a reflection of “bourgeois decay”, while Bakhtin strove to reveal its popular-democratic roots. The novel should not be seen as a compensation for the restlessness of contemporary society, uncovering the assured road to progress, but the embodiment of the dynamic forces that could shape society in a popular-democratic fashion. Thus where Lukács championed epic closure, Bakhtin highlighted novelistic openendedness; where Lukács advocated a strong narrative presence, Bakhtin advocated the maximalisation of multilingual intersection and the testing of discourse. Bakhtin takes a left Hegelian stance against Lukács; dialogism becomes analogous to Hegel’s Geist, both describing the social whole and standing in judgement over those eras in which the dialogic imperative is not realised.
The high point of Bakhtin’s populism can be seen in his now famous 1965 study of Rabelais and the heavily revised second edition of the 1929 Dostoyevsky book (1963). The former had been composed as Bakhtin’s doctoral dissertation which had been written in the late 1930s but was only prepared for publication when he emerged from obscurity in the 1960s. Tvorchestvo Fransua Rable i narodnaia kul´tura srednevekov´ia i renessansa (The work of François Rabelais and the Popular Culture of the Middle Ages and the Renaissance) is a remarkable work. Bakhtin concentrates on the collapse of the strict hierarchies of the Middle Ages and the beginning of the Renaissance by looking at the way in which ancient modes of living and working collectively, in accordance with the rhythms of nature, re-emerge in the forms of popular culture opposed to official culture. In Problemy poetiki Dostoevskogo (Problems of Dostoyevsky’s Poetics) Bakhtin summarises the essence of the question thus:
It could be said (with certain reservations, of course) that a person of the Middle Ages lived, as it were, two lives: one that was the official life, monolithically serious and gloomy, subjugated to a strict hierarchical order, full of terror, dogmatism, reverence and piety; the other was the life of the carnival square, free and unrestricted, full of ambivalent laughter, blasphemy, the profanation of everything sacred, full of debasing and obscenities, familiar contact with everyone and everything. Both these lives were legitimate, but separated by strict temporal boundaries. (p.129-30)
The activities of the carnival square: collective ridicule of officialdom, inversion of hierarchy, violations of decorum and proportion, celebration of bodily excess and so on embody, for Bakhtin, an implicit popular conception of the world. This conception is not, however, able to become ideologically elaborated until the radical laughter of the square entered into the “world of great literature” (Rabelais p.96). The novel of Rabelais is seen as the epitome of this process of breaking down the rigid, hierarchical world of the Middle Ages and the birth of the modern era. Rabelais is much more than a novelist for Bakhtin: his work embodies a whole new philosophy of history, in which the world is viewed in the process of becoming. The grotesque is the image of this becoming, the boundaries between person and person, person and thing, are erased as the individual merges with the people and the whole cosmos. As the individual body is transcended, the biological body is negated and the “body of historical, progressing mankind” moves to the centre of the system of images. In the carnival focus on death and rebirth the individual body dies, but the body of the people lives and grows, biological life ends but historical life continues.
The carnivalesque becomes a set of image-borne strategies for destabilising the official worldview. In a recently published article written for inclusion in the Soviet Literaturnaia entsiklopediia (Literary Encyclopaedia) in 1940, Bakhtin defines the satirical attitude as the “image-borne negation” of contemporary actuality as inadequacy, which contains within itself a positive moment in which an improved actuality is affirmed. This affirmed actuality is the historical necessity implicit in contemporary actuality and which is implied by the grotesque image. The grotesque, argues Bakhtin, “discloses the potentiality of an entirely different world, of another order, another way of life. It leads man out of the confines of the apparent (false) unity, of the indisputable and stable” (Rabelais p.48). The grotesque image of the body, as an image which reveals incomplete metamorphosis no longer represents itself, it represents what Hegel called the “universal dialectic of life”.
The Renaissance birth of the historical world led to a new development in the Enlightenment. Where Rabelais was presented as the high point of Renaissance literary and philosophical development, the Enlightenment reaches one of its high points in the work of Goethe. The process dispersing the “residue of otherworldly cohesion and mythical unity” was completed at this time, helping “reality to gather itself together and condense into the visible whole of a new world” (Speech Genres and Other Late Essaysp.45). The Enlightenment, argues Bakhtin in a section which draws heavily on Cassirer (the corresponding passage is The Philosophy of the Enlightenment p.197), should no longer be considered an a-historical era, but “an epoch of great awakening of a sense of time, above all … in nature and human life” (p.26). But, argues Bakhtin “this process of preparing for the disclosure of historical time took place more rapidly, completely, and profoundly in literary creativity than in the abstract philosophical, ideological views of Enlightenment thinkers” (p.26). Goethe’s imagination was fundamentally chronotopic, he visualised time in space:
Time and space merge … into an inseparable unity … a definite and absolutely concrete locality serves at the starting point for the creative imagination… this is a piece of human history, historical time condensed into space. Therefore the plot (sum of depicted events) and the characters … are like those creative forces that formulated and humanised this landscape, they made it a speaking vestige of the movement of history (historical time), and, to a certain degree, predetermined its subsequent course as well, or like those creative forces a given locality needs in order to organise and continue the historical process embodied in it. (p.49)
Goethe wanted to “bring together and unite the present, past and future with the ring of necessity” (p.39), to make the present creative. Like Rabelais, Goethe was as much a philosopher as a writer.
The same pattern of analysis shapes the 1963 version of the Dostoyevsky study. Here Dostoyevsky is no longer treated, as in the 1929 version, as a totally original innovator, but as the heir to a tradition rooted in popular culture. The novelist stood poised at the threshold of a new era, as the rigidly hierarchical Russian Empire was poised to give way to the catastrophic arrival of capitalist anarchy and ultimately revolution. Dostoyevsky thus intersected with the threshold poetics of carnival at a different stage in its development, he sought to present the voices of his era in a “pure simultaneity” unrivalled since Dante. In contradistinction to that of Goethe this chronotope was one of visualising relations in terms of space not time and this leads to a philosophical bent that is distinctly messianic:
Only such things as can conceivably be linked at a single point in time are essential and are incorporated into Dostoevskii’s world; such things can be carried over into eternity, for in eternity, according to Dostoevskii, all is simultaneous, everything coexists…. Thus there is no causality in Dostoevskii’s novels, no genesis, no explanations based on the past, on the influences of the environment or of upbringing and so forth. Every act a character commits is in the present, and in this sense is not predetermined; it is conceived of and represented by the author as free. (p.29)
The roots of such a conception lie in carnival and, according to Bakhtin, in the carnivalised philosophical dialogues that constituted the Menippean Satire. This philosophico-literary genre reaches a new stage in Dostoyevsky’s work, where the roots of the novel as a genre stands out particularly clearly. One of those roots was the Socratic Dialogue, which was overwhelmed by the monologic Aristotelian treatise, but which continued to lead a subterranean life in the non-canonical minor satirical genres and then became a constitutive element of the novel form and, implicitly, literary modernism. This accounts for its philosophical importance.
In his last years Bakhtin returned to the methodological questions that had preoccupied his earlier years, though now with a rather different perspective. This began with his work on speech genres in the 1950s, though apart from this study, did not yield any sustained texts until the 1970s. Bakhtin now began to stress the dialogic character of all study in the “human sciences”, the fact that one needs to deal with another “I” who can speak for and about his or herself in a fundamentally different way than with an inanimate and voiceless object. To this end he sought to differentiate his position from that of incipient Soviet structuralism, which adopted the “abstract objectivist” approach to language and the constitution of the subject. Bakhtin’s approach to subjectivity is dialogic, referring to the exchange of utterances rather than narrowly linguistic, and this extends to the analysis of texts which are always intertextual, meeting and illuminating each other. Just as texts have genres, “definite and relatively stable typical forms of construction of the whole” so too does speech. Thus the boundaries between complex genres such as those commonly regarded as literary and other less formalised genres should be seen as porous and flexible, allowing a dialogue of genres as well as styles.
The work of the Bakhtin circle is multifaceted and extremely pertinent to contemporary philosophical concerns. Yet their work moves beyond philosophy narrowly defined to encompass anthropology, literary studies, historiography and political theory. The vicissitudes of intellectual life in the Soviet Union have complicated assessment of the work of the circle, as has the way in which the works have been published and translated in recent years. On top of this, the works of the group have been read into a theoretical position framed by present-day concerns over poststructuralism and the fate of the subject in modern philosophy. A proper historical assessment of the work of the Bakhtin Circle will be much aided by the publication of Bakhtin’s Complete Works which will appear over the next few years. This will hopefully be followed by a harmonised English translation which will facilitate an informed assessment in the English speaking world.
University of Sheffield
Last updated: July 15, 2005 | Originally published: