James Beattie was a Scottish philosopher and poet who spent his entire academic career as Professor of Moral Philosophy and Logic at Marischal College in Aberdeen. His best known philosophical work, An Essay on The Nature and Immutability of Truth In Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism (1770), is a rhetorical tour de force which affirmed the sovereignty of common sense while attacking David Hume (1711-1776). A smash bestseller in its day, this Essay on Truth made Beattie very famous and Hume very angry. The work’s fame proved fleeting, as did Beattie’s philosophical reputation.
While the Essay on Truth is little read today, it is well worth reading. First, it is an important document in the history of the Scottish common sense school of philosophy inaugurated by Beattie’s colleague, Thomas Reid (1710-1796). Second, Beattie’s style– lively, polished, pure, and lucid–still has the power to please and charm. Finally, Beattie is an abler philosopher than his vociferous detractors were willing to allow. Though by no means an original or profound thinker, he can and should be given credit for presenting a systematic and accessible defense of a simple-sounding thesis – that philosophy cannot afford to despise the plain dictates of common sense.
This article (1) outlines Beattie’s life and career, (2) reviews the basic argument of the Essay on Truth, (3) summarizes the Essay‘s neglected critique of Hume’s racism, (4) briefly describes Beattie’s later Elements of Moral Science, and (5) reflects on Beattie’s place in the Scottish common sense school.
James Beattie was born October 25, 1735 in Laurencekirk, Kincardineshire, where his father was a farmer and shopkeeper. In 1749 Beattie began his studies at Marischal College, Aberdeen. In 1753, he was awarded the MA degree. He then spent several years as a schoolteacher and briefly contemplated becoming a minister. During this period he also secured the friendship of several influential personages. One of Beattie’s early patrons was James Burnett (1714-1799), better known to posterity as Lord Monboddo (which name Burnett assumed when appointed to the Court of Session in 1767).
In 1760, at the tender age of 25, Beattie was installed as Professor of Moral Philosophy and Logic at Marischal College. Shortly thereafter he was elected to the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, known to waggish locals as “the Wise Club.” Founded in 1758 by Thomas Reid (1710-1796) and John Gregory (1724-1773), the Society continued to hold meetings until 1773, nine years after Reid left for Glasgow to fill the Chair of Moral Philosophy vacated by Adam Smith (1723-1790). Much of Beattie’s later work had its origin in compositions read to his fellow Aberdonian “wise men” in the 1760s.
A decade after taking up his Professorship at Aberdeen, Beattie published the philosophical work for which he was (and is still) best known: An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth In Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism (1770) (hereinafter “Essay on Truth”). The honors piled up thick and fast: a doctorate of laws from Oxford; an audience with King George III; a Crown pension of 200 pounds a year; the approbation of discerning literati such as Edmund Burke and Samuel Johnson; and the opportunity to pose for Sir Joshua Reynolds. (Incidentally, Reynold’s portrait of Beattie – “The Triumph of Truth, with the Portrait of a Gentleman”- was hung in Marischal College.) Nor was enthusiasm for Beattie’s anti-skeptical treatise confined to the British Isles. The Essay was soon translated into French, German, and Dutch and discussed on the Continent. Beattie’s fame spread to the New World as well. In 1784 he was made a member of the American Philosophical Society.
Not all citizens of the Republic of Letters, however, were impressed by the Essay on Truth. The book’s target, the amiable and good-humored Hume, was incensed. “Truth!” he fumed, “there is no truth in it; it is a horrible large lie in Octavo.” Yet Hume, who had a policy of not answering critics, never deigned to reply directly to the cavils of “that bigoted silly fellow Beattie.” Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), too, had harsh words for Beattie. In Kant’s Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783), the Scottish prophet of common sense is portrayed as a superficial, obtuse dogmatist: “I should think that Hume might fairly have laid as much claim to common sense as Beattie, and in addition to a critical reason (such as the latter did not possess).” (For the record, however, it should be noted that Kant (unlike Hume) had an equally low opinion of Reid.)
Beattie wrote no philosophical work equal to the Essay in appeal or influence, although he continued to publish throughout the 1770s and 1780s. Many of these ostensibly “later” works (several of which actually date from the 1760s) are devoted to issues in aesthetics, rhetoric, and literary theory. They include An Essay on Poetry and Music (1776), On the Utility of Classical Learning (1776), An Essay on Laughter, and Ludicrous Composition (1779), and Dissertations Moral and Critical (1783). In addition, he compiled a lexicon entitled Scotticisms, arranged in Alphabetical Order (1787), in which he urged his educated compatriots to improve their English by “purifying” it of Scots expressions.
Beattie also earned plaudits as a poet, largely on the strength of The Minstrel; or, The Progress of Genius, written in Spenserian stanzas. The first part of The Minstrel appeared anonymously in 1771 (a year which also saw two editions of the Essay printed). The second part, to which the author put his name, followed in 1774. Replete with reflections upon Nature and the character of poetic genius, The Minstrel anticipates some of the central preoccupations of the Romantic movement.
Despite his apparent “aesthetic turn” in the post-Essay period, Beattie remained interested in the broader philosophical, moral, and religious questions that had originally prompted him to compose the Essay on Truth in the 1760s. 1786 saw the publication of Evidences of the Christian Religion Briefly and Plainly Stated, a two volume work of popular apologetics. This was followed by his final book, Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793). A lengthy collection of lectures delivered at Marischal College, the Elements deal with a wide range of topics in the philosophy of mind, epistemology, metaphysics, logic, ethics, political philosophy, economics, and natural theology.
Beattie’s later years were filled with affliction. His wife, Mary Beattie (née Dunn), went mad and was eventually committed to an asylum. Both of his children died, the elder son in 1790 and the younger in 1796. Weakened by grief, ill health, and a series of strokes, Beattie died in Aberdeen on August 18, 1803.
The Essay on Truth begins predictably enough, with a definition of – what else?- truth. Truth, Beattie avows, is identified with what “the constitution of our nature determines us to believe”; falsehood is identified with what “the constitution of our nature determines us to disbelieve.” (Part I. i). The distinction between common sense and reason is drawn in terms of the way that distinct classes of truths are apprehended. Common sense is identified as “that faculty by which we perceive self-evident truth,” whereas reason is “that power by which we perceive truth in consequence of a proof.” (I. i). With these definitions securely in place, Beattie advances the Essay‘s principal thesis — “common sense is the ultimate judge of truth,” (I. i) and reason must be subordinated to it. All sound reasoning, we are told, depends upon the principles of common sense:
In a word, the dictates of common sense are, in respect to human knowledge in general, what the axioms of geometry are in respect to mathematics: on the supposition that those axioms are false or dubious, all mathematical reasoning falls to the ground; and on the supposition that the dictates of common sense are erroneous and deceitful, all science, truth, and virtue, are vain. (I. ii. 9)
What are these axioms of common sense, these foundational principles on which all sound reasoning rests? It is not necessary to discuss all the principles listed in Beattie’s catalogue of common sense. For the purpose of illustration, a representative sample of four “principles of common sense” should suffice: (i) the evidence of perception (or “external sense”) is not fallacious, but fundamentally reliable; (ii) whatever begins to exist, proceeds from some cause; (iii) Nature is uniform; and (iv) human testimony is basically trustworthy. Armed with this arsenal of principles, Beattie can now confidently enter the lists against an assortment of formidable philosophical foes. Beattie wielded principle (i) against skeptics (be they Cartesian or Humean), as well as against Berkeleyan idealists; principle (ii) against atheist critics of cosmological arguments; principle (iii) against Humean skeptics about induction; and principle (iv) against Humean scoffers at miracles.
If Beattie is right about common sense, much (if not all) of modern philosophy is wrong. The basic mistake of the moderns lies in their tendency to make reason, not common-sense, the ultimate judge or arbiter of truth. Reason is a shameless upstart who, ignorant of its proper station, disgraces itself by refusing to submit to authority (in the form of common sense). Such insubordination can only lead to chaos, catastrophe, and confusion:
When Reason invades the rights of Common Sense, and presumes to arraign that authority by which she herself acts, nonsense and confusion must of necessity ensue; science will soon come to have neither head nor tail, beginning nor end; philosophy will grow contemptible; and its adherents, far from being treated, as in former times, upon the footing of conjurers, will be thought by the vulgar, and by every man of sense, to be little better than downright fools. (I. ii. 9)
Philosophers therefore despise common sense at their peril. But how are we to distinguish genuine principles of common sense from the pretenders? Is Beattie suggesting that any cherished conviction or idée fixe that I am unable to prove automatically qualifies as a dictate of common sense? He endeavours to supply us with criteria or marks by which authentic principles of common sense can be identified. (1) We are irresistibly inclined by nature to believe the principles of common sense. Our powerful attachment to them, being spontaneous and quasi-instinctive, cannot be destroyed by philosophical argument – no matter how ingenious. (2) The principles of common sense are universally accepted. Far from being prejudices peculiar to a given time, place, culture, sect, or class, they have been believed by virtually all people in all ages. (3) The principles of common sense cannot be proven because they are epistemologically foundational or basic. They cannot be justified by reference to some more evident proposition(s), because none exist. (4) The principles of common sense are indispensable presuppositions of our conduct and practice. We cannot live or act prudently unless we assume that our senses are reliable, that human testimony can be a source of knowledge, that past will resemble the future, and so on. Anyone who actually doubted or denied such principles would put himself on par with the lunatic or the fool.
Here it may be asked: In what way does Beattie’s Essay on Truth improve upon Thomas Reid’s earlier Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (1764)? The short answer is that it does not. Beattie freely admits that he is heavily indebted to Reid. However, the Essay differs from the Inquiry in one obvious respect: Beattie’s tract is infinitely more hard-hitting and caustic than anything ever penned by Reid. Where Reid writes respectfully of his opponents, Beattie tends to denounce and vilify them. Where Reid wraps up his subtle thoughts in restrained professorial prose, Beattie’s simple arguments are presented with the spleen and verve of the born orator. These contrasts reflect a more basic difference between our two defenders of common sense. Unlike Reid, Beattie is first and foremost a moralist and an apologist. He is not interested in defending a subtle or nuanced philosophical thesis. Rather, Beattie is defending a lofty (albeit vaguely defined) cause – to wit, “the cause of truth, virtue, and mankind.” Translated into more prosaic (but precise) terms, Beattie’s “cause” is that of deflecting philosophical opposition to a broadly Judeo-Christian understanding of human nature. According to this understanding, human beings are free but finite creatures made in the image of a good God or Creator. Neither brutes nor divinities, we occupy an intermediate place in creation and are better suited for action than for speculation. Inasmuch as our cognitive faculties are God-given, we may trust their deliverances – provided we acknowledge their limitations and exercise them under conditions that define our humble “middle state” (to quote Alexander Pope). Beattie’s bold strategy in the Essay was to argue that these familiar ideas about human nature are unassailable because they rest on the solid and irrefragable foundation of “common sense” (rather than philosophic demonstrability). Here was a book apt to reassure the devout but timorous Christian reader, for it confidently announced that Humean scepticism – and the bulk of modern philosophy – was infinitely more suited to be ridiculed than to be feared.
Although the Essay on Truth is largely devoted to re-instating the rights of common sense in the spheres of epistemology and metaphysics, it includes a forceful critique of Hume’s racism.
Hume’s racism? To some, this phrase may have a strange and novel sound. After all, Hume is usually portrayed as a patron saint of the Enlightenment: a genial cosmopolitan, sweetly reasonable, unfailingly courteous and amiable, “as approaching as nearly to the idea of a perfectly wise and virtuous man, as perhaps the nature of human frailty will permit” (in the oft-cited words of his friend, Adam Smith). Yet in Hume’s essay “Of National Characters,” we catch a glimpse of a different side of le bon David. For there, in an infamous footnote, Hume writes:
I am apt to suspect the negroes to be naturally inferior to the whites. There scarcely ever was a civilized nation of that complexion, nor any individual, eminent either in action or speculation. No ingenious manufactures amongst them, no arts, no sciences … [T]here are Negroe slaves dispersed all over Europe, of whom none ever discovered any symptoms of ingenuity.
In the Essay on Truth, Beattie condemns these sentiments: “These assertions are strong; but I know not whether they have anything else to recommend them.” (III. ii). Beattie does not stop there. Beattie does not merely fulminate against Hume’s racism with a self-serving show of conspicuous indignation; instead he rolls up his sleeves and adroitly dissects Hume’s pro-racist arguments. (1) Beattie disputes Hume’s basic assertions about the achievements (or alleged lack thereof) of non-European societies: “[W]e know that these assertions are not true … The Africans and Americans are known to have many ingenious manufactures and arts among them, which even Europeans would find it no easy matter to imitate.” (III. ii). (2) Moreover, Beattie says, Hume’s reasoning is invalid. For even if Hume’s claims were correct, his conclusion would not follow. “[O]ne may as well say of an infant, that he can never become a man, as of a nation now barbarous, that it never can be civilized.” (III. Ii). Should anyone doubt this, he need only recall that “[t]hat the inhabitants of Great Britain and France were as savage two thousand years ago, as those of Africa and America are at this day.” (III. ii). (3) Beattie is unimpressed by Hume’s argument that “there are Negroe slaves dispersed all over Europe, of whom none ever discovered any symptoms of ingenuity.” Beattie insists that this claim is unwarranted as well as false. But even if it were true, it would not justify belief in Hume’s natural inferiority thesis, for “the condition of a slave is not favourable to genius of any kind.” (III. ii). (4) While Beattie does not downgrade European achievements in the arts and sciences, he denies that they can be used to prove that European nations or “races” are superior. He stresses the extent that the achievements on which European nations pride themselves were either discovered by accident or the inventions of a gifted few, to whom alone all credit must go.
Beattie caps his rebuttal with two observations. First, his critique of Hume’s natural inferiority thesis indirectly supports the cause of religion because such racism cannot be reconciled neatly with a true Judeo-Christian understanding of human nature. Second, Beattie stresses that his disagreement with Hume on the subject of racism is not merely theoretical or speculative. On the contrary, the dispute is intensely practical, for the natural inferiority thesis can (and frequently was) invoked to justify slavery – an institution that Beattie, a committed abolitionist, decried as “a barbarous piece of policy.”
There is considerable overlap between the Essay on Truth and Beattie’s later Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793). The creed of common sense is again soberly recited. We are told that consciousness, memory, and testimony must be taken as trustworthy, that we can assume that Nature is uniform, that we are free moral agents, and that whatever begins to exist must proceed from some cause.
Despite these and other doctrinal similarities, the Elements differs from the Essay in at least four respects. First, stylistically the Essay was full of sarcasm, scorn and splendid invective, while the Elements is comparatively tame, subdued, and dry. Second, the Elements is more philosophically constructive than the Essay, as Beattie now appears more interested in building and inhabiting his own modest system than in laying siege to the systems of foes and rivals. Third, the Elements offers a more in-depth exploration of several topics only lightly touched upon in the Essay (for example, perception, natural theology, and immortality). Finally, the Elements offers sustained coverage of several areas, such as political philosophy and economics, that are not meaningfully discussed in the Essay.
Historians of Scottish philosophy frequently describe Beattie’s Essay as a simplified version of the philosophy of common sense expounded by Reid in his Inquiry of 1764. While there is much truth in this judgment, it need not be construed as a reproach. Popularization can be done well or badly. Beattie did it well.
Nevertheless, it is undeniable that Reid’s views on matters philosophical evolved in a way that Beattie’s never did. After retiring from teaching in 1781, Reid published two major works, Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785) and Essays on the Active Powers of Man (1788). More sophisticated and constructive than anything Beattie ever produced, these two books, along with Reid’s earlier Inquiry, became the founding documents of the Scottish common sense school of philosophy. The Reidian gospel was soon propagated with aplomb by Edinburgh Chair-holder Dugald Stewart (1753-1828), who had listened to Reid’s lectures in Glasgow. An elegant stylist, Stewart championed common sense both in his well-attended lectures and in his edifying books, the first pair of which – Elements of the Philosophy of the Human Mind (1792) and Outlines of Moral Philosophy (1793) – appeared around the same time as Beattie’s Elements of Moral Science. Stewart’s interest in Reid was shared by another renowned Edinburgh professor, the erudite but preternaturally verbose Sir William Hamilton (1788-1856). No slavish disciple, Hamilton sought to “improve” on Reid’s philosophy in various ways, often by drawing on Kantian doctrines. A singular philosophical beast, the resulting hybrid was slain, stuffed, and mounted by John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) in An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy (1865). Nevertheless, Hamilton’s extensively (or, as some might say, obsessively) annotated edition of Reid’s Collected Works did much to make them more widely available.
With Reid cast thus as the heroic founder of the emerging Scotch school, Beattie was relegated to the supporting role of ardent and skilful propagandist. This, at any rate, was how Dugald Stewart portrays Beattie in a letter to Sir William Forbes, Beattie’s friend and biographer. Stewart declares that the Essay on Truth is effective as “a popular antidote against the illusions of metaphysical scepticism,” but, he is quick to add, Beattie’s polemic lacks the subtlety, patience, and precision we find in Reid. Nevertheless, Stewart avers that Beattie’s achievement is not negligible:
These critical remarks on the “Essay on Truth” (I must request you to observe) do not in the least affect the essential merits of that very valuable performance; and I have stated them with the greater freedom, because your late excellent friend possessed so many other unquestionable claims to high distinction – as a moralist, as a critic, as a grammarian, as a pure and classical writer, and, above all, as the author of the “Minstrel.” In any one of the different paths to which his ambition has led him, it would not perhaps be difficult to name some of his contemporaries by whom he has been surpassed; but where is the individual to be found, who has aspired with greater success to an equal variety of literary honours?
Stewart’s verdict still seems a just one. Beattie was a talented, ambitious, and multi-faceted man of letters, but his gifts and merits as a philosopher were not the greatest. If philosophy is indeed “a series of footnotes to Plato” (Whitehead), then Beattie can be read as a dramatic footnote to Reid and – ironically – to the abhorred Hume.
Last updated: April 3, 2007 | Originally published: