Cesare Beccaria (1738-1794) was born the eldest son in an aristocratic family and educated at a Jesuit school. In his mid-twenties, Beccaria became close friends with Pietro and Alessandro Verri, two brothers who formed an intellectual circle called “the academy of fists” which focused on reforming the criminal justice system. Through this group Beccaria became acquainted with French and British political philosophers, such as Hobbes, Hume, Diderot, Helvetius, Montesquieu, and Hume. At the encouragement of Pietro, Beccaria wrote On Crimes and Punishments (1764). Some background information was provided by Pietro, who was in the process of authoring a text on the history of torture, and Alessandro was an official at a Milan prison had first hand experience of the prison’s appalling conditions. The brief work relentlessly protests against torture to obtain confessions, secret accusations, the arbitrary discretionary power of judges, the inconsistency and inequality of sentencing, using personal connections to get a lighter sentence, and the use of capital punishment for serious and even minor offenses. Almost immediately, the work was translated into French and English and went through several editions. Philosophers of the time hailed it, and several European emperors vowed to follow it. With great hesitation, Beccaria acted on an invitation to Paris to meet the great thinkers of the day. A chronically shy person, Beccaria made a poor impression at Paris and returned to Milan after three weeks. Beccaria continued to gain official recognition and held several nominal political positions in Italy. Separated from the invaluable input from his friends, though, he failed to produce another text of equal importance. Outside Italy, an unfounded myth grew that Beccaria’s literary silence owed to Austrian restrictions on free expression in Italy.
Editions of Beccaria’s text follow two distinct arrangements of the material: that by Beccaria himself, and that by French translator Andre Morellet (1765) who imposed a more systematic order to Beccaria’s original text. Beccaria opens his work describing the great need for reform in the criminal justice system, and he observes how few studies there are on the subject of such reform. Throughout his work, Beccaria develops his position by appealing to two key philosophical theories: social contract and utility. Concerning the social contract, Beccaria argues that punishment is justified only to defend the social contract and to ensure that everyone will be motivated to abide by it. Concerning utility (perhaps influenced by Helvetius), Beccaria argues that the method of punishment selected should be that which serves the greatest public good.
Contemporary political philosophers distinguish between two principle theories of justifying punishment. First, the retributive approach maintains that punishment should be equal to the harm done, either literally an eye for an eye, or more figuratively which allows for alternative forms of compensation. The retributive approach tends to be retaliatory and vengeance-oriented. The second approach is utilitarian which maintains that punishment should increase the total amount of happiness in the world. This often involves punishment as a means of reforming the criminal, incapacitating him from repeating his crime, and deterring others. Beccaria clearly takes a utilitarian stance. For Beccaria, the purpose of punishment is to create a better society, not revenge. Punishment serves to deter others from committing crimes, and to prevent the criminal from repeating his crime.
Beccaria argues that Punishment should be swift since this has the greatest deterrence value. He defends his view about the swiftness of punishment by appealing to the theory of the association of ideas (developed most notably by David Hume and David Hartley). According to associationists, if we know the rules by which the mind connects together two different ideas (such as the ideas of crime and punishment), then we can strengthen their association. For Beccaria when a punishment quickly follows a crime, then the two ideas of “crime” and “punishment” will be more quickly associated in a person’s mind. Also, the link between a crime and a punishment is stronger if the punishment is somehow related to the crime. Given the fact that the swiftness of punishment has the greatest impact on deterring others, Beccaria argues that there is no justification for severe punishments. In time we will naturally grow accustomed to increases in severity of punishment, and, thus, the initial increase in severity will lose its effect. There are limits both to how much torment we can endure, and also how much we can inflict.
Beccaria touches on an array of criminal justice practices, recommending reform. For example, he argues that dueling can be eliminated if laws protected a person from insults to his honor. Laws against suicide are ineffective, and thus should be eliminated, leaving punishment of suicide to God. Bounty hunting should not be permitted since it incites people to be immoral and shows a weakness in the government. He argues that laws should be clear in defining crimes so that judges do not interpret the law, but only decide whether a law has been broken. Punishments should be in degree to the severity of the crime. Treason is the worst crime since it harms the social contract. This is followed by violence against a person or his property, and, finally, by public disruption. Crimes against property should be punished by fines. The best ways to prevent crimes are to enact clear and simple laws, reward virtue, and improve education.
In On Crimes and Punishments Beccaria presents one of the first sustained critiques of the use of capital punishment. Briefly, his position is that capital punishment is not necessary to deter, and long term imprisonment is a more powerful deterrent since execution is transient. He starts by describing the connection between the social contract and our right to life. Locke argued that people forfeit their right to life when they initiate a state of war with other people. Beccaria disagrees. Following Hobbes, Beccaria believes that, in the social contract, we negotiate away only the minimal number of rights necessary to bring about peace. Thus, people hold onto their right to life, and do not hand this over to the public good. Given the fact that capital punishment cannot be justified by Locke’s reasoning, Beccaria argues that the only other justification is that it is either necessary or useful for public good. He contests both of these claims. For Beccaria, history shows that capital punishment fails to deter determined criminals. What we know about human nature also suggests that it has minimal deterrence value. A steady example over a long period of time is more effective in creating moral habits than is a single shocking example of an execution. Beccaria argues that perpetual slavery is a more effective deterrent than capital punishment. Since we should choose the least severe punishment which accomplishes our purpose (that is, deterrence), then perpetual slavery is the preferred mode of punishment for the worst crimes. From the spectator’s perspective, observing perpetual slavery will have a more lasting impression than capital punishment. Perpetual slavery will also seem more terrible from the vantage of the spectator, than from the criminal himself. Beccaria explains the psychology of the criminal who wishes to return to the state of nature in view of the gross inequity between the rich and the poor. Again, perpetual slavery is the best deterrence against this motivation. Beccaria argues further that the death penalty in fact has bad effects on society by reducing their sensitivity to human suffering. Potential criminals see it as one more method of perpetuating tyranny. Although capital punishment is practiced in most countries, it is still an error which in time will become rare. He urges rulers to adopt his stance against capital punishment, and predicts that this will give them a lasting fame as peacemakers.
The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.
Last updated: April 11, 2001 | Originally published: