Behaviorism

Behaviorism was a movement in psychology and philosophy that emphasized the outward behavioral aspects of thought and dismissed the inward experiential, and sometimes the inner procedural, aspects as well; a movement harking back to the methodological proposals of John B. Watson, who coined the name.  Watson’s 1912 manifesto proposed abandoning Introspectionist attempts to make consciousness a subject of experimental investigation to focus instead on behavioral manifestations of intelligence.  B. F. Skinner later hardened behaviorist strictures to exclude inner physiological processes along with inward experiences as items of legitimate psychological concern.  Consequently, the successful “cognitive revolution” of the nineteen sixties styled itself a revolt against behaviorism even though the computational processes cognitivism hypothesized would be public and objective — not the sort of private subjective processes Watson banned.  Consequently (and ironically), would-be-scientific champions of consciousness now indict cognitivism for its “behavioristic” neglect of inward experience.

The enduring philosophical interest of behaviorism concerns this methodological challenge to the scientific bona fides of consciousness (on behalf of empiricism) and, connectedly (in accord with materialism), its challenge to the supposed metaphysical inwardness, or subjectivity, of thought.  Although behaviorism as an avowed movement may have few remaining advocates, various practices and trends in psychology and philosophy may still usefully be styled “behavioristic”. As long as experimental rigor in psychology is held to require “operationalization” of variables, behaviorism’s methodological mark remains.  Recent attempts to revive doctrines of “ontological subjectivity” (Searle 1992) in philosophy and bring “consciousness research” under the aegis of Cognitive Science (see Horgan 1994) point up the continuing relevance of behaviorism’s metaphysical and methodological challenges.

Table of Contents

  1. Behaviorists and Behaviorisms
    1. Psychological Behaviorists
      1. Precursors: Wilhelm Wundt, Ivan Pavlov
      2. John B. Watson: Early Behaviorism
      3. Intermediaries: Edward Tolman and Clark Hull
      4. B. F. Skinner: Radical Behaviorism
      5. Post-Behaviorist and Neo-behavioristic Currents: Externalism and Connectionism
    2. Philosophical Behaviorists
      1. Precursors, Preceptors, & Fellow Travelers: William James, John Dewey, Bertrand Russell
      2. Logical Behaviorism: Rudolf Carnap
      3. Ordinary Language Behaviorists: Gilbert Ryle, Ludwig Wittgenstein
      4. Reasons , Causes, and the Scientific Imperative
      5. Later Day Saints: Willard van Orman Quine and Alan Turing
      6. The Turing Test Conception: Behaviorism as Metaphysical Null Hypothesis
      7. Logical Behaviorism Metaphysically Construed
  2. Objections & Discussion
    1. Technical Difficulties
      1. Action v. Movement
      2. From Paralytics to Perfect Actors
      3. The Intentional Circle
      4. Methodological Complaints
    2. The Ur-Objection: Consciousness Denied
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Behaviorists and Behaviorisms

Behaviorism, notoriously, came in various sorts and has been, also notoriously, subject to variant sortings: “the variety of positions that constitute behaviorism” might even be said to share no common-distinctive property, but only “a loose family resemblance” (Zuriff 1985: 1) . Views commonly styled “behavioristic” share various of the following marks:

  • allegiance to the “fundamental premise … that psychology is a natural science” and, as such, is “to be empirically based and … objective” (Zuriff 1985: 1);
  • denial of the utility of introspection as a source of scientific data;
  • theoretic-explanatory dismissal of inward experiences or states of consciousness introspection supposedly reveals;
  • specifically antidualistic opposition to the “Cartesian theater” picture of the mind as essentially a realm of such inward experiences;
  • more broadly antiessentialist opposition to physicalist or cogntivist portrayals of thought as necessarily neurophysiological or computational;
  • theoretic-explanatory minimization of inner physiological or computational processes intervening between environmental stimulus and behavioral response;
  • mistrust of the would-be scientific character of the concepts of “folk psychology” generally, and of the would-be causal character of its central “belief-desire” pattern of explanation in particular;
  • positive characterization of the mental in terms of intelligent “adaptive” behavioral dispositions or stimulus-response patterns.

Among these features, not even Zuriff’s “fundamental premise” is shared by all (and only) behaviorists. Notably, Gilbert Ryle, Ludwig Wittgenstein, and followers in the “ordinary language” tradition of analytic philosophy, while, for the most part, regarding behavioral scientific hopes as vain, hold views that are, in other respects, strongly behavioristic. Not surprisingly, these thinkers often downplay the “behaviorist” label themselves to distinguish themselves from their scientific behaviorist cousins. Nevertheless, in philosophical discussions, they are commonly counted “behaviorists”: both emphasize the external behavioral aspects, deemphasize inward experiential and inner procedural aspects, and offer broadly behavioral-dispositional construals of thought.

a. Psychological Behaviorists

i. Precursors: Wilhelm Wundt, Ivan Pavlov

Wundt is often called “the father of experimental psychology.” He conceived the subject matter of psychology to be “experience in its relations to the subject” (Wundt 1897: 3). The science of experience he envisaged was supposed to be chemistry like: introspected experiential data were to be analyzed; the basic constituents of conscious experience thus identified; and the patterns and laws by which these basic constituents combine to constitute more complex conscious experiences (e.g., emotions) described. Data were to be acquired and analyzed by trained introspective Observers. While the analysis of experience was supposed to be a self-contained enterprise, Wundt — originally trained as a physiologist — fully expected that the structures and processes introspective analysis uncovered in experience would parallel structures and processes physiological investigation revealed in the central nervous system. Introspectionism, as the approach was called, soon spread, and laboratories sprang up in the United States and elsewhere, aiming “to investigate the facts of consciousness, its combinations and relations,” so as to “ultimately discover the laws which govern these relations and combinations” (Wundt 1912: 1). The approach failed primarily due to the unreliability of introspective Observation. Introspective “experimental” results were not reliably reproducible by outside laboratories: Observers from different laboratories failed to agree, for instance, in their Observation (or failure to Observe) imageless thoughts (to cite one notorious controversy).

Pavlov’s successful experimental discovery the laws of classical conditioning (as they came to be called), by way of contrast, provided positive inspiration for Watson’s Behaviorist manifesto. Pavlov’s stimulus-response model of explanation is also paradigmatic to much later behavioristic thought. In his famous experiments Pavlov paired presentations to dogs of an unconditioned stimulus (food) with an initially neutral stimulus (a ringing bell). After a number of such joint presentations, the unconditional response to food (salivation) becomes conditioned to the bell: salivation occurs upon the ringing of the bell alone, in the absence of food. In accord with Pavlovian theory, then, given an animal’s conditioning history behavioral responses (e.g., salivation) can be predicted to occur or not, and be controlled (made to occur or not), on the basis of laws of conditioning, answering to the stimulus-response pattern:

S -> R

Everything adverted to here is publicly observable, even measurable; enabling Pavlov to experimentally investigate and formulate laws concerning temporal sequencing and delay effects, stimulus intensity effects, and stimulus generalization (opening doors to experimental investigation of animal perception and discrimination).

Edward Thorndike, in a similar methodological vein, proposed “that psychology may be, at least in part, as independent of introspection as physics” (Thorndike 1911: 5) and pursued experimental investigations of animal intelligence. In experimental investigations of puzzle-solving by cats and other animals, he established that speed of solution increased gradually as a result of previous puzzle exposure. Such results, he maintained, support the hypothesis that learning is a result of habits formed through trial and error, and Thorndike formulated “laws of behavior,” describing habit formation processes, based on these results. Most notable among Thorndike’s laws (presaging Skinnerian operant conditioning) is his Law of Effect:

Of several responses made to the same situation, those which are accompanied or closely followed by satisfaction to the animal will, other things being equal, be more firmly connected with the situation, so that, when it recurs, they will be more likely to recur; those which are accompanied or closely followed by discomfort to the animal will, other things being equal, have their connections with that situation weakened, so that, when it recurs, they will be less likely to occur. The greater the satisfaction or discomfort, the greater the strengthening or weakening of the bond . (Thorndike 1911)

In short, rewarded responses tend to be reinforced and punished responses eliminated. His methodological innovations (particularly his “puzzle-box”) facilitated objective quantitative data collection and provided a paradigm for Behaviorist research methods to follow (especially the “Skinner box”).

ii. John B. Watson: Early Behaviorism

Watson coined the term “Behaviorism” as a name for his proposal to revolutionize the study of human psychology in order to put it on a firm experimental footing. In opposition to received philosophical opinion, to the dominant Introspectionist approach in psychology, and (many said) to common sense, Watson (1912) advocated a radically different approach. Where received “wisdom” took conscious experience to be the very stuff of minds and hence the (only) appropriate object of psychological investigation, Watson advocated an approach that led, scientifically, “to the ignoring of consciousness” and the illegitimacy of “making consciousness a special object of observation.” He proposed, instead, that psychology should “take as a starting point, first the observable fact that organisms, man and animal alike, do adjust themselves to their environment” and “secondly, that certain stimuli lead the organisms to make responses.” Whereas Introspectionism had, in Watson’s estimation, miserably failed in its attempt to make experimental science out of subjective experience, the laboratories of animal psychologists, such as Pavlov and Thorndike, were already achieving reliably reproducible results and discovering general explanatory principles. Consequently, Watson — trained as an “animal man” himself — proposed, “making behavior, not consciousness, the objective point of our attack” as the key to putting the study of human psychology on a similar scientific footing. Key it proved to be. Watson’s revolution was a smashing success. Introspectionism languished, behaviorism flourished, and considerable areas of our understanding of human psychology (particularly with regard to learning) came within the purview of experimental investigation along broadly behavioristic lines. Notably, also, Watson foreshadows Skinner’s ban on appeals to inner (central nervous) processes, seeming to share the Skinnerian sentiment “that because so little is known about the central nervous system, it serves as the last refuge of the soul in psychology” (Zuriff 1985: 80). Watson is, consequently, loath to hypothesize central processes, going so far as to speculate that thought occurs in the vocal tract, and is — quite literally — subaudible talking to oneself (Watson 1920).

iii. Intermediaries: Edward Tolman and Clark Hull

Tolman and Hull were the two most noteworthy figures of the movement’s middle years. Although both accepted the S-R framework as basic, Tolman and Hull were far more willing than Watson to hypothesize internal mechanisms or “intervening variables” mediating the S-R connection. In this regard their work may be considered precursory to cognitivism, and each touches on important philosophical issues besides. Tolman’s purposive behaviorism attempts to explain goal-directed or purposive behavior, focusing on large, intact, meaningful behavior patterns or “molar” behavior (e.g., kicking a ball) as opposed to simple muscle movements or “molecular” behavior (e.g., various flexings of leg muscles); regarding the molecular level as too far removed from our perceptual capacities and explanatory purposes to provide suitable units for meaningful behavioral analysis. For Tolman, stimuli play a cognitive role as signals to the organism, leading to the formation of “cognitive maps” and to “latent learning” in the absence of reinforcement. Overall,

The stimuli which are allowed in are not connected by just simple one-to-one switches to the outgoing responses. Rather the incoming impulses are usually worked over and elaborated in the central control room into a tentative cognitive-like map of the environment. And it is this tentative map, indicating routes and paths and environmental relationships, which finally determines what responses, if any, the animal will finally make. (Tolman 1948: 192)

Clark Hull undertook the ambitious program of formulating an exhaustive theory of such mechanisms intervening between stimuli and responses: the theory was to take the form of a hypothetical-deductive system of basic laws or “postulates” enabling the prediction of behavioral responses (as “output variables”) on the basis of external stimuli (“input variables”) plus internal states of the organism (“intervening variables”). Including such organismic “intervening” variables (O) in the predictive/explanatory laws results in the following revised explanatory schema:

S & O -> R

The intervening O-variables Hull hypothesized included drive and habit strength. Attributes of, and relations among, these variables are what the postulates describe: further attributes and relationships were derived as theorems and corollaries from the basic postulates. Hull’s student, Edward Spence, attempted to carry on with the program, without lasting success. Expected gains in predictive-explanatory scope and precision were not achieved and, with hindsight, it is easy to see that such an elaborate theoretical superstructure, built on such slight observational-experimental foundations, was bound to fall. Hull’s specific proposals are presently more historical curiosities than live hypotheses. Nevertheless, currently prevalent cognitivist approaches share Hull’s general commitment to internal mechanisms.

iv. B. F. Skinner: Radical Behaviorism

Skinner’s self-described “radical behaviorist” approach is radical in its insistence on extending behaviorist strictures against inward experiential processes to include inner physiological ones as well. The scientific nub of the approach is a concept of operant conditioning indebted to Thorndike’s “Law of Effect.” Operants (e.g., bar-presses or key-pecks) are units of behavior an organism (e.g., a rat or pigeon) occasionally emits “spontaneously” prior to conditioning. In operant conditioning, operants followed by reinforcement (e.g., food or water) increase in frequency and come under control of discriminative stimuli (e.g., lights or tones) preceding the response. By increasingly judicious reinforcement of increasingly close approximations, complex behavioral sequences are shaped. On Skinner’s view, high-level human behavior, such as speech, is the end result of such shaping. Prolonged absence of reinforcement leads to extinction of the response. Many original and important Skinnerian findings — e.g., that constantly reinforced responses extinguish more rapidly than intermittently reinforced responses — concern the effects of differing schedules of reinforcement. Skinner notes the similarity of operant behavioral conditioning to natural evolutionary selection: in each case apparently forward-looking or goal-directed developments are explained (away) by a preceding course of environmental “selection” among randomly varying evolutionary traits or, in the psychological case, behavioral tricks. The purposiveness which Tolman’s molar behavioral description assumes, radical behaviorism thus claims to explain. Likewise, Skinner questions the explanatory utility of would-be characterizations of inner processes (such as Hull’s): such processes, being behavior themselves (though inner), are more in need of explanation themselves, Skinner holds, than they are fit to explain outward behavior. By “dismissing mental states and processes,” Skinner maintains, radical behaviorism “directs attention to the … history of the individual and to the current environment where the real causes of behavior are to be found” (Skinner 1987: 75). On this view, “if the proper attention is paid to the variables controlling behavior and an appropriate behavioral unit is chosen, orderliness appears directly in the behavior and the postulated theoretical processes become superfluous” (Zuriff: 88). Thus understood, Skinner’s complaint about inner processes “is not that they do not exist, but that they are not relevant” (Skinner 1953) to the prediction, control, and experimental analysis of behavior.

Skinner stressed prediction and control as his chief explanatory desiderata, and on this score he boasts that “experimental analysis of behaviour” on radical behaviorist lines “has led to an effective technology, applicable to education, psychotherapy, and the design of cultural practices in general” (Skinner 1987: 75). Even the most strident critics of radical behaviorism, I believe, must accord it some recognition in these connections. Behavior therapy (based on operant principles) has proven effective in treating phobias and addictions; operant shaping is widely and effectively used in animal training; and behaviorist instructional methods have proven effective — though they may have become less fashionable — in the field of education. Skinnerian Behaviorism can further boast of significantly advancing our understanding of stimulus generalization and other important learning-and-perception related phenomena and effects. Nevertheless, what was delivered was less than advertised. In particular, Skinner’s attempt to extend the approach to the explanation of high-grade human behavior failed, making Noam Chomsky’s dismissive (1959) review of Skinner’s book, Verbal Behavior, something of a watershed. On Chomsky’s diagnosis, not only had Skinner’s attempt at explaining verbal behavior failed, it had to fail given the insufficiency of the explanatory devices Skinner allowed: linguistic competence (in general) and language acquisition (in particular), Chomsky argued, can only be explained as expressions of innate mechanisms — presumably, computational mechanisms. For those in the “behavioral sciences” already chaffing under the severe methodological constraints Skinnerian orthodoxy imposed, the transition to “cognitive science” was swift and welcome. By 1985 Zuriff would write, “the received wisdom of today is that behaviorism has been refuted, its methods have failed, and it has little to offer modern psychology” (Zuriff 1985: 278). Subsequent developments, however, suggest that matters are not that simple.

v. Post-Behaviorist and Neo-behavioristic Currents: Externalism and Connectionism

Several recent developments inside and beside the mainstream of “cognitive science” — though their proponents have not been keen to style themselves “behaviorists” — appear to be rather behavioristic. Semantic externalism is the view that “meanings ain’t in the head” (Putnam 1975: 227) but depend, rather, on environmental factors; especially on sensory and behavioral intercourse with the referents of the referring thoughts or expressions. If emphasis on the outward or behavioral aspects of thought or intelligence — and attendant de-emphasis of inward experiential or inner procedural aspects — is the hallmark of behaviorism, semantic externalism is, on its face, behavioristic (though this is seldom remarked). Emphasis (as by Burge 1979) on social (besides the indexical, or sensory-behavioral) determinants of reference — on what Putnam called “the linguistic division of labor” — lends this view a distinct Wittgensteinean flavor besides. Such externalist “causal theories” of reference, although far from unquestioned orthodoxy, are currently among the leading cognitive scientific contenders. Less orthodox, but even more behavioristic, is the procedural externalism advocated by Andy Clark (2001), inspired by work in “Situated Cognition, Distributed and Decentralized Cognition, Real-World Robotics, and Artificial Life” (Clark 2001: abstract); identifying thought with “complex and iterated processes which continually loop between brain, body, and technological environment”; according to which the “intelligent process just is the spatially and temporally extended one which zig-zags between brain, body, and world” (Clark 2001: 132). Perhaps most importantly, the influential connectionist hypothesis that the brain does parallel processing of distributed representations, rather than serial processing of localized (language-like) representations, also waxes behavioristic. In parallel systems, typically, initial programming (comparable to innate mechanisms) is minimal and the systems are “trained-up” to perform complex tasks over a series of trails, by a process somewhat like operant shaping.

b. Philosophical Behaviorists

i. Precursors, Preceptors, & Fellow Travelers: William James, John Dewey, Bertrand Russell

In opposition to the “Structuralist” philosophical underpinnings of introspectionism, behaviorism grew out of a competing “Functionalist” philosophy of psychology that counted Dewey and William James among its leading advocates. Against structuralist reification of the content of experience, Dewey urged that sensations be given a functional characterization, and proposed to treat them as functionally defined occupants of roles in the “reflex arc” which — since it “represents both the unit of nerve structure and the type of nerve function” — should supply the “unifying principle and controlling working hypothesis in psychology” (Dewey 1896: 357); though the arc, Dewey insisted, is misunderstood if not viewed in broader organic-adaptive context. On another front — against structuralist reification of the subject of experience — William James famously maintained,

that ‘consciousness,’ when once it has evaporated to this estate of pure diaphaneity, is on the point of disappearing altogether. It is the name of a nonentity, and has no right to a place among first principles. Those who still cling to it are clinging to a mere echo, the faint rumor left behind by the disappearing ‘soul’ upon the air of philosophy.

James hastened to add, that he meant “only to deny that the word [`consciousness'] stands for an entity, but to insist most emphatically that it does stand for a function” (James 1912). The James-Lange theory of emotions — which holds that “the bodily changes follow directly the PERCEPTION of the exciting fact, and that our feeling of the same changes as they occur IS the emotion (James 1884: 189-190) — prefigures later behavioristic deflationary analyses of other categories of presumed mentation.

Bertrand Russell was among the first philosophers to recognize the philosophical significance of the behaviorist revolution Watson proposed. Though never a card-carrying behaviorist himself — insisting that the inwardness or “privacy” of “sense-data” “does not by itself make [them] unamenable to scientific treatment” (Russell 1921: 119) — Russell, nevertheless, asserted that behaviorism “contains much more truth than people suppose” and regarded it “as desirable to develop the behaviourist method to the fullest possible extent” (Russell 1927: 73), proposing a united front between behaviorism and science-friendly analytic philosophy of mind. Such fronts soon emerged on both the “formal language” and “ordinary language” sides of ongoing analytic philosophical debate.

ii. Logical Behaviorism: Rudolf Carnap

What is sometimes called the “formalist” or “ideal language” line of analytic philosophy seeks the logical and empirical regimentation of (would-be) scientific language for the sake of its scientific improvement. “Logical behaviorism” refers, most properly, to Carnap and Hempel’s proposed regimentation of psychological discourse on behavioristic lines, calling for analyses of mental terms along lines consonant with the Logical Empiricist doctrine of verificationism (resembling the “operationism” of P.W. Bridgman 1927) they espoused. According to verificationism, a theoretic attribution — say of temperature — as in “it’s 23.4º centigrade” “affirms nothing other than” that certain “physical test sentences obtain”: sentences describing the would-be “coincidence between the level of the mercury and the mark of the scale numbered 23.4″ on a mercury thermometer, and “other coincidences,” for other measuring instruments (Hempel 1949: 16-17). Similarly, it was proposed, that for scientific psychological purposes, “the meaning of a psychological statement consists solely in the function of abbreviating the description of certain modes of physical response characteristic of the bodies of men and animals” (Hempel 1949: 19), the modes of physical response by which we test the truth of our psychological attributions. “Paul has a toothache” for instance would abbreviate “Paul weeps and makes gestures of such and such kinds”; “At the question `What is the matter?,’ Paul utters the words `I have a toothache’”; and so on (Hempel 1949: 17). As Carnap and Hempel came to give up verificationism, they gave up logical behaviorism, and came to hold, instead, that “the introduction and application of psychological terms and hypotheses is logically and methodologically analogous to the introduction and application of the terms and hypotheses of a physical theory.” Theoretical terms on this newly emerging (and now prevalent) view need only be loosely tied to observational tests in concert with other terms of the theory. They needn’t be fully characterized, each in terms of its own observations, as on the “narrow translationist” (Hempel 1977: 14) doctrine of logical behaviorism. As verificationism went, so went logical behaviorism: liberalized requirements for the empirical grounding of theoretical posits encouraged the taking of “cognitive scientific” liberties (in practice) and (in theory) the growth of cognitivist sympathies among analytic philosophers of mind. Still, despite having been renounced by its champions as unfounded and having found no new champions; and despite seeming, with hindsight, clearly false; logical behaviorism continues to provoke philosophical discussion, perhaps due to that very clarity. Appreciation of how logical behaviorism went wrong (below) is widely regarded by cognitivists as the best propaedeutic to their case for robust recourse to hypotheses about internal computational mechanisms.

iii. Ordinary Language Behaviorists: Gilbert Ryle, Ludwig Wittgenstein

The “ordinary language” movement waxed most strongly in the work of Ryle and Wittgenstein around the middle of the twentieth century. Their investigations are “meant to throw light on the facts of our language” in its everyday employment (Wittgenstein 1953: §130). Where the formalist seeks the logical and empirical regimentation of would-be scientific language, including psychological terms, Ryle and Wittgenstein regard our everyday use of mental terminology as unimpeached by its scientific “defects” … which are not defects … because such talk is not in the scientific line of business. To misconstrue talk of people “as knowing, believing, or guessing something, as hoping, dreading, intending or shirking something, as designing this or being amused at that” (Ryle 1949: 15) on the model of scientific hypotheses about inner mechanisms misconstrues the “logical grammar” (Wittgenstein) of such talk, or makes a “category-mistake” (Ryle). Philosophical puzzlements about knowledge of other minds and mind-body interaction arise from such misconstrual: for instance, attempts to solve the mind-body problem, Ryle claims, “presuppose the legitimacy of the disjunction `Either there exist minds or there exist bodies (but not both)’” which “would be like saying, `Either she bought a left-hand and a right-hand glove or she bought a pair of gloves (but not both)’” (Ryle 1949: 22-3). The most basic misconstrual (Wittgenstein’s and Ryle’s diagnoses concur) involves thinking — when we talk of “knowing, believing, or guessing,” etc. — “that these verbs are supposed to denote the occurrence of specific modifications” either mechanical (in brains) or “paramechanical” (in streams of consciousness):

So we have to deny the yet uncomprehended process in the yet unexplored medium. And now it looks as if we have denied the mental processes. And naturally we don’t want to deny them.” (Wittgenstein 1953: §308)

Not wanting to deny, e.g., “that anyone ever remembers anything” (Wittgenstein 1953: §306) Wittgenstein and Ryle offer broadly dispositional stories about how mentalistic talk does work, in place of “the model of ‘object and designation’” (Wittgenstein 1953: §293) they reject.

According to Wittgenstein on the object-designation model — where the object is supposed to be private or introspected — it “drops out of consideration as irrelevant” (Wittgenstein 1953: §293): the “essential thing about private experience” here is “not that each person possesses his own exemplar” but “that nobody knows whether other people also have this or something else” (§272). So, if “someone tells me that he knows what pain is only from his own case” this would be as if

everyone had a box with something in it: we call it a `beetle’. No one can look in anyone else’s box, and everyone says he knows what a beetle is only by looking at his beetle. — Here it would be quite possible for everyone to have something different in his box. One might even imagine such a thing constantly changing. — But suppose the word `beetle’ had a use in these people’s language? — If so, it would not be used as the name of a thing. The thing in the box has no place in the language-game at all; not even as a something: for the box might even be empty. — No, one can `divide through’ by the thing in the box; it cancels out, whatever it is. (§293)

Rather than referring to inner experiences, sensation words, according to Wittgenstein, “are connected with the primitive, the natural, expressions of the sensation and used in their place” (§246): self-attributions of “pain” and other sensation terms are avowals not descriptions: “A child has hurt himself and he cries; and then adults talk to him and teach him exclamations and, later, sentences. They teach the child new pain-behaviour.” Here, Wittgenstein explains, he is not “saying that the word `pain’ really means crying”: rather, “the verbal expression of pain replaces crying and does not describe it” (§244). Avowals join the “natural expressions” to supply the “outward criteria” which logically (not just evidentially) constrain and enable the uses sensation and other “`inner process’” words have in our public language (§580). Furthermore, Wittgenstein famously argues, we cannot even coherently imagine a private language “in which a person could write down or give vocal expression to his inner experiences” exclusively “for his private use” because the “private ostensive definition” (§380) required to fix the reference of the would-be sensation-denoting expression could not establish a rule for its use. “To think one is obeying a rule is not to obey a rule” and in the case of usage consequent on the envisaged private baptism “thinking one was obeying a rule would be the same thing as … obeying” (§202).

For Ryle, when we employ the “verbs, nouns and adjectives, with which in ordinary life we describe the wits, characters, and higher-grade performances of people with whom we have do” (Ryle 1949: 15) “we are not referring to occult episodes of which their overt acts and utterances are effects; we are referring to those overt acts and utterances themselves” (25) or else to a “disposition, or a complex of dispositions” (15) to such acts and utterances. “Dispositional words like `know’, `believe’, `aspire’, `clever’, and `humorous”’ signify multi-track dispositions: “abilities, tendencies or pronenesses to do, not things of one unique kind, but things of lots of different kinds” (118): “to explain an action as done from a specified motive or inclination is not to describe the action as the effect of a specified cause”: being dispositions, motives “are not happenings and are not therefore of the right type to be causes” (113). Accordingly, “to explain an act as done from a certain motive is not analogous to saying that the glass broke, because a stone hit it, but to the quite different type of statement that the glass broke, when the stone hit it, because the glass was brittle” (87). The force of such explanation is not “to correlate [the action explained] with some occult cause, but to subsume it under a propensity or behavior trend” (110). The explanation does not prescind from the act to its causal antecedents but redescribes the act in broader context, telling “a more pregnant story,” as when we explain the bird’s “flying south” as “migration”; yet, Ryle observes,” the process of migrating is not a different process from that of flying south; so it is not the cause of its flying south” (142). Finally, the connection between disposition and deed, as Ryle understands it, is a logical-criterial, not a contingent-causal one: brave deeds are not caused by bravery, they constitute it (as the “soporific virtue,” or sleep-inducing power, of opium doesn’t cause it to induce sleep since tending to induce sleep is this power or “virtue”).

iv. Reasons , Causes, and the Scientific Imperative

For formalists, the informality and imprecision of ordinary language formulations invite criticism. Take Ryle’s “migration” comparison: either, it would seem, Ryle is saying that everyday psychological explanations yield only vague interpretive understanding, having no scope for scientific development; or else, it would seem, the “more pregnant story” must be formalizable in terms of predictive-explanatory laws (as of migration, in Ryle’s example) with logical-behaviorial-definition-like rigor (if not content). The point of logical behaviorist analysis is to scientifically ground talk of “belief,” “desire,” “sensation,” and the rest, whose everyday use seems empirically precarious. With this aim in mind, “explanatory” procession from low-level matter-of-fact description (“flying south”) to more interpretive description (“migration”), such as Ryle envisages, seems to move in the wrong direction … unless, again, the “more pregnant story” is not just redescriptive but delivers scientific theoretic gains in the form of more general and precise explantory-predictive laws. A related debate raged fiercely through the nineteen fifties and early sixties between defenders of the (would-be) scientific status of “motive” or “belief-desire” explanations (notably Hempel) and champions of the Rylean thesis that “reasons aren’t causes” (Elizabeth Anscombe and Stuart Hampshire, among them). Donald Davidson’s (1963) defense of “the ancient — and commonsense — position that rationalization is a species of causal explanation” is widely recognized as a watershed in this debate, though it remains doubtful to what extent cognivists retain rights to the water shed, since Davidson counts reasons to be causal in virtue of noncognitive (low-level physical) properties. On the other hand, philosophers in the ordinary language tradition (e.g., Hampshire 1950, Geach 1957) raised daunting technical difficulties (below) for the “narrow translationist” plans of logical behaviorism. Such criticisms hastened the advent of cognitivism as an alternative to behaviorism of any stripe among philosophers unwilling to abide the informality, imprecision, and seeming scientific defeatism of the ordinary language approach.

v. Later Day Saints: Willard van Orman Quine aand Alan Turing

Quine, considered by many to be the greatest Anglo-American philosopher of the last half of the twentieth century, was a self-avowed “behaviorist,” and such tendencies are evident in several areas of his thought, beginning with his enthusiasm for a linguistic turn (as Bergmann 1964 styled it: see Rorty 1967) in the philosophy of mind. “A theory of mind,” Quine writes, “can gain clarity and substance … from a better understanding of the workings of language, whereas little understanding of the working of language is to be hoped for in mentalistic terms” (Quine 1975: 84). Quine’s “naturalized” inquiries concerning knowledge and language attempt, further, to incorporate empirical findings and methods from Skinnerian psychology. In contrast to logical behaviorism (above), notably, Quine “never … aspired to the ascetic adherence to operational definitions” and always acknowledged — indeed insisted – that science “settles for partial criteria and for partial explanations” of its theoretic posits “in terms of other partially explained notions” (Quine 1990: 291). Still, he is not keen — as his cognitivist contemporaries (for example, Putnam) and followers (for example, Fodor) are — about the prospects such looser empiricist strictures offer for scientific deployment of mentalistic vernacular terms like “belief,” “desire,” and “sensation”. To standard behaviorist concern about the empirical credentials of alleged private entities and introspective reports, Quine adds the consideration that talk of “belief”, “desire”, and other intentional mental states is so logically ill-behaved as to be irreconcilable with materialism and scientifically unredeemable. In the final analysis, however, the behaviorism Quine proposes is methodological. His final metaphysical word is physicalism: “having construed behavioral dispositions in turn as physiological states, I end up with the so called identity theory of mind: mental states are states of the body” (Quine 1975: 94); yet, his antiessentialism here (as elsewhere) lends his physicalism a behavioristic cast (see next section).

Alan Turing is transitional. Along with the digital age, his theory of computation helped inspire the cognitivist revolution, making him, by some lights the first cognitivist. On the other hand, the methodological behaviorism of Turing’s proposed Imitation Game test for artificial intelligence (the “Turing test”) has been widely remarked and “the Turing test conception” of intelligence may be considered a parade case of metaphysical behaviorism for purposes of refutation (as by Block 1981) or illustration (as follows).

vi. The Turing Test Conception: Behaviorism as Metaphysical Null Hypothesis

The Imitation Game proposed by Turing (1950) was originally a game of female impersonation: the aim of the game for the (male) querant is to pass for (that is, be judged by the questioner to be) female. The Turing test replaces the male querant with a computer whose aim is to pass for human. This simplified setup (Turing’s actual proposal involves an additional complication, a third participant or foil besides to the querant and questioner) can be used to explain the metaphysical character of the dispute as a dispute about essence. In the original (man-woman) Imitation Game, notice, however good the impersonation, it doesn’t make the querant female. Something else is essential: it’s the content of their chromosomes (not their conversation) that makes the querant female or not. Different proposals for what that essential something is in the case of thought, then, represent different metaphysical takes on the nature of mind. In the Turing test scenario these different [proposed essences] represent further conditions necessary to promote intelligent-seeming behavior into actual intelligence, and sufficing for intelligence, or mentation, even in the absence of such behavior.

Dualistic Essentialism: S -> [(the right) conscious experiential processes] -> R
Physicalistic Essentialism: S -> [(the right) physical processes] -> R
Cognitivistic Essentialism: S -> [(the right) computational processess] -> R
Behavioristic Inessentialism: S -> [whatever works] -> R

Dualistic theories propose a conscious experiential essence; physicalistic (or “mind-brain identity”) theories propose a physical (specifically, neurophysiological) essence; and cognitivistic theories a procedural or computational essence. Behaviorism, in contrast, doesn’t care what mediates the intelligent-seeming S -> R connection; behavioristically speaking, intelligence is as intelligence does regardless of the manner of the doing (experiential, neurophysiological, computational, or otherwise). Behaviorism, thus construed, “is not a metaphysical theory: it is the denial of a metaphysical theory” and consequently “asserts nothing” (Ziff 1958: 136); at least, nothing positively metaphysical.

vii. Logical Behaviorism Metaphysically Construed

Logical behaviorism may be seen, in the light of the preceding, as attempting to stipulate nominal essences (Locke 1690: IIiii15) where dualism, physicalism, and cognitivism propose to discover real ones. Further, although the motives of its founders (Carnap and Hempel) were chiefly epistemic or “methodological,” logical behaviorism seemed to many to invite metaphysical exploitation. Because the definitions Carnap and Hempel proposed sought to specify observationally necessary and sufficient conditions for true attributions of the mental terms in what they called “the physical thing language,” the successful completion of this program, it seemed, would reduce the mental to the physical. Mentalistic descriptions of people as “expecting pain” or “having toothaches” would be completely replaceable, in principle and without cognitive loss, by talk of bodily transitions; thoughts and experiences would thus be shown to be nothing above and beyond such bodily transitions; vindicating materialism. As the the methodological emphasis of early analytic philosophy receded and was replaced by more frankly metaphysical concerns among formalist analytic philosophers of mind, it was chiefly this would-be metaphysical application of logical behaviorism that came increasingly under philosophical scrutiny.

2. Objections & Discussion

a. Technical Difficulties

i. Action v. Movement

Ordinary language philosophers were among the first to raise daunting difficulties for the strict translationist program which, they argued, was guilty of a category mistake — or at least of wildly underestimating the impracticability of what they were proposing — in conflating the concepts of action and movement under the heading of “behavior.” As D. W. Hamlyn puts this complaint, “where activity is exhibited, it is not necessarily inappropriate to talk of movements, but it will be so to do so in the same context, in the same universe of discourse”:

With movements we are concerned with physical phenomena, the laws concerning which are in principle derivable from the laws of physics. But the behaviour which we call “posting a letter” or “kicking a ball” involves a very complex series of movements, and the same movements will not be exhibited on all occasions on which we should describe the behavior in the same way. No fixed criteria can be laid down which will enable us to decide what series of movements shall constitute “posting a letter.” Rather we have learnt to interpret a varying range of movements as coming up to the rough standard which we observe in acknowledging a correct description of such behaviour as posting a letter. (Hamlyn 1953: 134-135)

The task of defining mentalistic predications such as “wanting to score a goal” in terms of outward acts — or dispositions to acts — like kicking a ball (Tolman’s “molar behavior”) seems daunting enough; the task of casting the definition in terms of movements or “molecular behavior” — “colorless movements and mere receptor impulses” (Watson), “motions and noises” (Ryle) — seems beyond daunting.

ii. From Paralytics to Perfect Actors

If the mental were completely definable in outwardly behavioral terms — as logical behaviorism proposes — then outward behavioral capacities or dispositions would be necessary for thought or experience. But a complete paralytic, it seems, might still think thoughts (e.g., I can’t move), harbor desires (e.g., to move) and experience (e.g., despairing) sensations. Such possibilities are, on their face, contrary to logical behaviorism. From the logical behaviorist perspective, while such cases may complicate the description of the mental in behavioral terms, they do not seem fatal. It may be replied, e.g., that wanting to move is being disposed to move if able and, since the various possible causes of the disability (severed spinal cords, curare poisoning, etc.) are physically specifiable, this envisaged complication is wholly consistent with behaviorist strictures and reductionist hopes. Hilary Putnam’s imagined super-super-spartans (“X-worlders“) are less easily countered. X-worlders (as Putnam called them) “suppress all … pain behavior” by “a great effort of will” for “what they regard as important ideological reasons” (Putnam 1963: 332-334). Like paralytics, these super-super-spartans “lack the behavioral dispositions envisioned by the behaviorists to be associated with pain, even though they do in fact have pain” (Block 1981: 12); but, unlike paralytics, they lack these dispositions for psychological reasons: efforts of will undertaken for ideological reasons — unlike severed spinal cords and doses of curare — would not be physically specifiable and any envisaged complications of the behavioral definitions attempting to build exceptions for these causes would be inconsistent with behaviorist strictures and reductionist hopes. And contrary to the sufficiency of behavior for pain that logical behaviorist definitions would imply, “an exactly analogous example of perfect pain-pretenders shows that no behavioral disposition is sufficient for pain either” (Block 1981: 12: emphasis added).

iii. The Intentional Circle

Among the technical arguments against logical behaviorism, the most influential has been the “intentional circle” argument harking back to Chisholm (1957, ch. 11) and Geach (1957, p. 8): indeed the perfect actor line of counterexamples “flows out of the Chisholm-Geach point” as Block (1981:12) notes. A desire to stay dry, for instance, will dispose you to carry an umbrella only on the condition that you believe it might rain; and, conversely, the belief it might rain will dispose you to carry an umbrella only on the condition that you desire to stay dry. Such Geach-Chisholm type examples show that “which behavioral dispositions a desire issues in depends on other states of the desirer. And similar points apply to behaviorist analyses of belief and other mental states” (Block 1981: 12). While this point is most plain with respect to intentional mental states such as belief and desire, perfect actor examples seem to show it to extend to sensations, such as pain, as well: “a disposition to pain behavior is not a sufficient condition of having pain, since the behavioral disposition could be produced by a number of different combinations of mental states, e.g., [pain + a normal preference function] or by [no pain + an overwhelming desire to appear to have pain]” (Block 1981: 15); and, conversely, the dispositions are not a necessary condition since unpained-behavior dispositions might be produced by, e.g. [no pain + a normal preference function] or by [pain + an overwhelming desire to appear not to have pain]. “Conclusion: one cannot define the conditions under which a given mental state will issue in a given behavioral disposition” as logical behaviorism proposes “without adverting to other mental states” (Block 1981: 12), which logical behaviorism precludes. Such arguments are widely “regarded as decisive refutations of behaviorist analyses of many mental states, such as belief, desire, and pain” (Block 1981: 13). The “functionalist” doctrine that a mental state is “definable in terms of its causal relations to inputs, outputs, and other mental states” (Block 1980: 257), not to inputs and outputs alone (a la logical behaviorism), also flows directly from the Geach-Chisholm point.

In truth, as Putnam himself notes, whether refutation of the “admittedly oversimplified position” of logical behaviorism refutes behaviorism tout court depends on the extent to which “the defects which this position exhibits are also exhibited by the more complex and sophisticated positions which are actually held” (Putnam 1957: 95). Notably, perfect actor and other would-be thought experimental counterexamples to behaviorism would counterexemplify metaphysical construals which those who have actually held “the more complex and sophisticated positions” at issue, for the most part, explicitly disavow. Also, notably, Ryle’s characterization of intentional mental states (in particular) as multi-track “dispositions the exercises of which are indefinitely heterogenous” (Ryle 1949: 44) seems already to allow for intentional “circularity”: Tolman and Hull-style behaviorism even explicitly embraces it. For refutation of behaviorism tout court to be claimed, cognitivism would be have to be so simply identified with the view that a mental state is “definable in terms of its causal relations to inputs, outputs, and other mental states” that Tolman, Hull, and Ryle, count as cognitivists. That’s too simple. One may agree “that the logically necessary and sufficient conditions for the ascription of a mental state” would have to “refer not just to environmental variables but to other mental states of the organism” (Fodor 1975: 7 n.7) — that mental attributions have to be reduced all together (or holistically) not one by one (atomistically) — yet behavioristically refuse the call for further computational (or physical or phenomenological) constraints on what count as mental states. The “faith that … one will surely get to pure behavioral ascriptions” — motions and noises — “if only one pursues the analysis far enough” (Fodor 1975: 7 n.7) is also behavioristically dispensable. Notably these two tacks have their costs: the first abandons hope for essential scientific characterization of the mental. The second abandons hope for reductionist exploitation of behaviorist ideas on behalf of materialism. So chastened, behaviorism, while defensible, seems, to many, too boring to merit further philosophical bother.

iv. Methodological Complaints

Fodor’s summation of the complaint against against methodological behaviorism is succinct: by it, he maintains, “[p]sychology is … deprived of its theoretical terms” meaning “psychologists can provide methodologically reputable accounts only of such aspects of behavior as are the effects of environmental variables”; but “the spontaneity and freedom from local environmental control that behavior often exhibits” makes “this sort of methodology intolerably restrictive” (Fodor 1975: 1-2). Furthermore, “there would seem to be nothing in the project of explaining behavior by reference to mental processes which requires a commitment to [their] epistemological privacy in the traditional sense” of conscious subjectivity. “Indeed,” Fodor continues, “for better or worse, a materialist cannot accept such a commitment since his view is that mental events are a species of physical events, and physical events are publicly observable, at least in principle” (Fodor 1975: 4): the commitment is to inner computational not inward experiential processes. However, while Fodor 1975 adduces, “failure of behavioristic psychology to provide even a first approximation to a plausible theory of cognition” (Fodor 1975: 8) in support of cognitivist alternatives, Fodor 2000 confesses “that the most interesting — certainly the hardest — problems about thinking are unlikely to be much illuminated by any kind of computational theory we are now able to imagine” (Fodor 2000: 1). As for more isolated or “modular” processes (e.g., syntactic processing) where the “Computational Theory of Mind” by Fodor’s lights remains “by far the best theory of cognition that we’ve got; indeed, the only one we’ve got that’s worth the bother” (Fodor 2000: 1) … here, where, in Fodor’s judgment, behaviorism failed “to provide even a first approximation of a plausible theory,” cognitivism may be faulted with producing too many: elaborate theoretical superstructures built on slight observational-experimental foundations reminiscent of Hull’s. Notably, since Chomsky’s watershed “Review of Verbal Behavior by B. F. Skinner” Chomsky himself has held at least four distinct syntactic theories, and his currently fashionable “Minimalist Theory” presently competes with at least five distinct others. (Chomsky’s four theories (in chronological order) have been Transformational Grammar (1965), Extended Standard Theory (1975), Government and Binding (1984), and Minimalism (1995). Competing theories include, notably, Lexical Function Grammar (Bresnan), Head-Driven Phrase Structure Grammar (Sag, Pollard), Functionalism (see Newmeyer), Categorial Grammar (Steedman), and Stratificational Grammar (Lamb).)

b. The Ur-Objection: Consciousness Denied

Behaviorism’s disregard for consciousness struck many from the first, and continues to strike many today, as contrary to plain self-experience and plain common-sense; not to mention all that makes life precious and meaningful. In this vein behaviorism has been “likened to `Hamlet’ without the Prince of Denmark” (Ryle 1949: 328) and behaviorists accused of “affecting general anesthesia” (Ogden & Richards 1926: 23) and made the butt of jokes in the vein of the following (see Ziff 1958):

Q: What does one behaviorist say to another when they meet on the street?
A: You’re fine. How am I?
Q: What does one behaviorist say to another after sex?
A: That was great for you. How was it for me?

In the same vein as John Searle still complains “the behaviorist seems to leave out the mental phenomena in question,” (Searle 1992: 34), E. B. Titchener complained, at the movement’s outset, of behaviorism’s “irrelevance to psychology as psychology is ordinarily understood” (Titchener 1914: 6). On the other hand Titchener’s prediction — that, due to this irrelevance, introspective psychology would continue to flourish alongside behaviorism — with hindsight, seems a bit laughable itself. As Ryle puts it, “the extruded hero,” consciousness, for scientific purposes, “soon came to seem so bloodless and spineless a being that even the opponents of these [behaviorist] theories began to feel shy of imposing heavy burdens upon his spectral shoulders” (Ryle 1949: 328). Ryle’s countercomplaint still rings true today despite recent attempts to revive consciousness as a subject of serious scientific inquiry; or, more to the point especially, in light of such attempts, which all, in one way or another, seek to revive the Wundtian program of correlating introspected experiential with observed neurophysiological events. While it may be urged that the hero was never wholly extruded but has been lurking all along in the caves of psychophysics (e.g., in correlations of physical stimulus variations with noticed differences in sensation), recent attempts to extend this psychology-as-psychophysics approach beyond psychophysics remain nascent at best.

“Imagery from Galton on has been the inner stronghold of a psychology based on introspection” (Watson 1913: 421) and here, with regard to direct sensory presentations (e.g., afterimages) and sensations (e.g., pain) — so-called qualia – the “neglect of consciousness” complaint against behaviorism is most acutely felt; and here it must be confessed that behaviorist replies have been mostly halting and evasive. Watson, confessing, “I may have to grant a few sporadic cases of imagery to him who will not be otherwise convinced” would marginalize the phenomena, insisting, “that the images of such a one are as sporadic and as unnecessary to his well-being and well-thinking as a few hairs more or less on his head” (Watson 1913: 423n.3) — a verdict Ryle deems confirmed. Scientifically, the “extruded hero,” it seems, can neither explanans nor explanandum be. Inward experience seems, scientifically, as nonexplanatory (of intentionality, intelligence, or other features of mind we should like to explain) as it seems itself scientifically inexplicable. Nevertheless, Ryle frankly confesses that “there is something seriously amiss” with his own treatment of sensations (Ryle 1949: 240) and, even, “not to know the right idioms to discuss these matters” in behavioristic good conscience; only hoping, his “discussion of them in the official idioms may have at least some internal Fifth Column efficacy” (Ryle 1949: 201). Still, inward experiences seem just as unaccountable on inner computational grounds as on outward behavioral ones — Kossyln’s 1980 data structural analysis of images as two dimensional data arrays, e.g., leaves their qualia still unaccounted for. Behavioristic losses on the count of qualia are, by no means, cognitivistic gains. Cognitivism itself “has been plagued by two `qualia’ centered objections” in particular: the Inverted Qualia Objection that, possibly, e.g., “though you and I have exactly the same functional organization, the sensation that you have when you look at red things is phenomenally the same as the sensation that I have when I look at green things” (Block 1980: 257); and the Absent Qualia Objection “that it is possible that a mental state of a person x be functionally identical to a state of y, even though x‘s state has qualitative character while y‘s state lacks qualitative character altogether” (Block 1980: 258).

Methodologically, then, the matter of consciousness remains about where Watson left it, as scientifically intractable as it seems morally crucial and common-sensically inescapable. Unless there is more scientific gold in those psychophysical hills than recently renewed attempts to mine them by Crick (1994) Edelman (1989) and others (see Horgan 1994) suggest, this is apt to be where matters remain for the foreseeable future. Notice, metaphysical dualism (identifying mental events with private, subjective, nonphysical, “modes” of conscious experience) may be held consistently with methodological behavioristic commitment to the explanatory superfluity of such factors by disallowing such events their apparent causal roles in the generation of behavior. Epiphenomenalism denies their causal efficacy altogether. Parallelism just denies their “downward” (mental-to-physical) causal efficacy. It is due, largely, to their reluctance to embrace such drastic expedients as parallelism and epiphenomenalism that, despite recently renewed would-be scientific interest in consciousness, most cognitive scientists and allied analytic philosophers continue to reject metaphysical dualism — remaining true to their metaphysical, along with their methodological, behavioral roots.

The enduring cogency of behaviorism’s challenge to the scientific bona fides of consciousness means that methodologically, at least, there seems no viable alternative to “practically everybody in cognitive science” remaining — if not “a behaviorist of one sort or another” (Fodor 2001: 13-14) — at least, behavioristic in some manner. Cognitive Science killed Behaviorism, they say. Still, Cognitive Science seems entitled to its last name only on condition that it retain a good measure of behavioristic conscience.

3. References and Further Reading

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  • Burge, Tyler. “Individualism and the Mental.” Studies in Metaphysics: Midwest Studies in Philosophy, vol. 4. Ed. P. French, T. Uehling, and H. Wettstein. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1979: 73-121.
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  • Chomsky, Noam. Lectures on Government and Binding: The Pisa Lectures. Dordrecht Holland: Foris Publications, 1984.
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Author Information

Larry Hauser
Email: hauser@alma.edu
Alma College
U. S. A.