The Aim of Belief

It is often said that belief has an aim. This aim has been traditionally identified with truth and, since the late 1990s, with knowledge. With this claim, philosophers designate a feature of belief according to which believing a proposition carries with it some sort of commitment or teleological directedness toward the truth (or knowledge) of that proposition. This feature is taken to be constitutive of belief (that is, it is part of what a belief is that it is an attitude having this aim) and individuative of that type of mental state (that is, it is sufficient for distinguishing beliefs from other types of mental attitude like desire and imagining). Philosophers appeal to belief’s aim mainly for explanatory purposes: the aim is supposed to explain a number of other features of belief, such as the impossibility of believing at will, the infelicity of asserting Moorean sentences (for example, “I believe that it is raining, but it is not raining”), and the normative force of evidential considerations in the processes of belief-formation and revision.

Though many tend to agree on the above aspects of the aim, there are major disagreements over two further issues: (1) how to interpret the claim that belief has an aim, and (2) what this aim is. With respect to (1), the claim has received very different interpretations. Some have interpreted it literally, taking the aim as an intentional purpose of believers or a functional goal of beliefs; others have interpreted it metaphorically, as some kind of commitment or norm governing beliefs and their regulation (formation, maintenance, and revision); still others deny that beliefs aim at truth in a substantive sense and endorse minimalist accounts of belief’s truth-directedness. With respect to (2), there is an ongoing debate on whether the aim of belief is truth, knowledge, or some other condition such as epistemic justification.

Table of Contents

  1. The Truth-Directedness of Belief
    1. The Aim as Constitutive and Individuative of Belief
    2. Differences between the Aim and Other Properties of Belief
    3. The Explanatory Role of the Aim
  2. Interpretations of the Aim
    1. Teleological Interpretations
    2. Normative Interpretations
    3. Minimalist Interpretations
  3. What Does Belief Aim At?
  4. Relevance of the Topic
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Truth-Directedness of Belief

The claim that “belief aims at truth” was first coined by Bernard Williams (1973) to designate a set of properties of beliefs, namely (1) that truth and falsehood are dimensions of assessment of beliefs as opposed to other psychological states and dispositions; (2) that to believe that p is to believe that p is true; and (3) that to say “I believe that p” carries, in general, a claim that p is true; that is, it is a qualified way of asserting that p is true (Williams, 1973, p. 137).

Since Williams, many have taken up the claim that belief aims at truth. However, with such an expression, these philosophers do not refer to a set of properties as Williams did, but to a unique feature of belief (sometimes also called truth-directedness). This feature (that is, aiming at truth) is supposed to capture the specific relation of belief with truth. This relation seems to be peculiar to belief, and to play an important role in the characterization of this type of attitude. No other attitude seems to entertain such a special relation with truth. Like belief, the content of attitudes like (propositional) desires, imaginings, and mere thoughts can be true or false. But differently from these attitudes, beliefs are considered defective if their content is false, or correct if it is true: if I imagine that snow is black, there is nothing defective in my imagination; but if I believe that snow is black, there is something wrong with my belief. Also, we can arbitrarily decide to form or revise attitudes like imagining and assuming regardless of whether we take their contents to be true or false, but this seems not to be possible for beliefs. In short, these attitudes are not sensitive to truth-regarding considerations in the way beliefs are (in both normative and descriptive ways). The relation of belief with truth also differs from that of factive attitudes like knowledge and regret. Differently from beliefs, these attitudes imply the truth of their content. If I know that it is raining now in Paris, then it is true that it is raining now in Paris. But if I believe that, the content of my belief may be false. The relation of belief to truth is thus neither as weak as that of other attitudes like imagining, nor as strong as that of knowledge. This is why it is often conceived as an aim or a commitment toward the truth (or knowledge) of the believed proposition: beliefs may fail to be true (to achieve that aim), not that they may fail to aim at truth.

That granted, a further question is how to interpret the claim that beliefs aim at truth. Philosophers conceive of truth-directedness in very different ways: as an intentional aim of the believer to accept a proposition if and only if it is true; as a function regulating our cognitive processes; as a norm requiring one to believe a proposition only if true; as a value attached to believing truly. In this section I remain neutral on the specific interpretations of the aim, postponing a discussion of these interpretations to §2. The objective of the present section is to introduce some properties commonly attributed to truth-directedness, independent of its specific interpretation. For ease of exposition, it will also be assumed that truth is the aim of belief until §3, where alternative candidates are considered.

Section 1.a introduces two properties commonly attributed to truth-directedness: (1) that it is a constitutive or essential feature of belief, and (2) that it is individuative of belief with respect to other mental attitudes. Section 1.b considers the differences between truth-directedness and other truth-related properties of belief such as the direction of fit and the value of having true beliefs. The truth-aim is usually attributed to belief in order to explain a number of characteristics of this attitude concerning its relation with truth. Section 1.c lists the main features that truth-directedness is supposed to explain.

a. The Aim as Constitutive and Individuative of Belief 

When philosophers attribute an aim to belief, they conceive of this property as constitutive of this type of attitude. This means, roughly, that it is part of what a belief is (that is, part of the essence or the concept of belief) that it is a mental attitude directed at the truth. Let us label this the constitutivity thesis. Depending on how we conceive truth-directedness, there will be different ways of working up to this thesis. If, for example, we interpret truth-directedness as a goal of the agent (compare §2.a), we can conceive of beliefs as analogous to acts like concealing (Steglich-Petersen, 2006, p. 512). Part of what it is to conceal an object X is that it is a type of act involving the goal that someone will not find X. It is in virtue of this goal that an action counts as an instance of concealing. Similarly, a way of stating the constitutivity thesis for belief is that it is part of what S’s believing that p is that S has an aim or goal (or that it is a function of S’s cognitive system) to retain that attitude only if it is true. It is in virtue of this aim of the agent who believes (or this function of her cognitive system) that that attitude counts as belief.

Alternatively, if one interprets truth-directedness as a norm to believe only the truth (compare §2.b), the constitutivity thesis amounts to understanding this norm by analogy to rules constitutive of practices like games (Wedgwood, 2002, p. 268). A practice is constituted by a set of rules if and only if it is part of what that practice is that this set of rules is in force for agents engaged in that practice (Glüer & Pagin, 1998). Consider a specific example: chess is a game constituted by a set of rules stating which moves are legal or permissible in the game. If one plays chess, one is thereby committed by the rules of the game to perform only legal moves. The performance of a particular act does not count as a chess-move if it cannot be assessed (justified, criticized…) according to the constitutive rules of the game. Similarly, if it is part of what a belief is that it is an attitude governed by a norm to believe only the truth, a mental attitude does not count as a belief if it cannot be assessed (criticized, justified…) on the basis of this norm, as right or correct if true and wrong or incorrect if false. One can also conceive of the constitutivity thesis by analogy to other types of entity essentially constituted by norms or values. For example, it is constitutive of what it is to be a citizen to be subject to certain rights and commitments, and it is constitutive of murder to be an act of killing in a wicked, inhumane, or barbarous way (for the latter example, see Dretske, 2000, pp. 243-245).

The claim that truth-directedness is constitutive of belief can be conceived of in at least two ways, as relative to the concept of belief or to its nature. According to the conceptual interpretation, it is a condition of understanding the concept of belief that we conceive of beliefs as mental attitudes directed toward truth (Boghossian, 2003; Engel, 2004; Shah, 2003). A proper understanding of the concept of bachelor implies conceiving of a bachelor as an unmarried man. Analogously, if one has a correct grasp of the concept of belief and conceives of a mental attitude as a belief, she understands it as one that, in some sense to be specified, is directed toward truth.

Other philosophers consider truth-directedness as constitutive of the nature or essence of belief (Brandom, 2001; Railton, 1994; Velleman, 2000a; Wedgwood, 2002, 2007). The relation between belief and truth-directedness is here conceived of as one of metaphysical dependence of the former on the latter: as it is essential to water that it has a certain chemical composition (H2O), it is essential to belief that it is an attitude involving a commitment to or an aim at truth. A mental attitude counts as a belief at least partially in virtue of aiming at the truth. It is simply impossible for an attitude to be a belief if it lacks this property.

It is usually held that the essentialist interpretation of the thesis does not entail the conceptual one (for example, Wedgwood, 2007, ch. 6). It is part of the essence of water, but not of its concept, that water is H2O—we can understand the concept of water without conceiving water as having that specific chemical composition. Similarly the truth-aim may be constitutive of the essence of belief but not of its concept (see Zangwill, 2005 for a similar view). Also, some philosophers have argued that the conceptual interpretation does not entail the essentialist one (Papineau, 2013; Shah, 2003, fn. 41; Shah & Velleman, 2005, fn. 43; Wedgwood, 2007).

The second property commonly attributed to truth-directedness is the individuativity of belief: the aim is the feature that individuates belief as that type of mental state and distinguishes beliefs from other mental attitudes (Engel, 2004; Lynch, 2009; Railton 1994; Velleman, 2000a; Wedgwood, 2002). Though many other attitudes entertain relations with truth (compare §1.b), it is claimed that belief is the only attitude aiming at truth. The truth-aim plays a fundamental role in sorting out beliefs from other mental attitudes, being the distinctive feature of beliefs with respect to other types of attitude like thoughts, suppositions, desires, and imagining.

Philosophers usually appeal to the individuativity of truth-directedness for belief for two main reasons: (1) singling out the aim as a peculiarly distinctive property of belief helps to achieve a better grasp of what truth-directedness is and to distinguish this property from other properties of belief (a philosopher who assumes individuativity in order to define truth-directedness is Velleman, 2000a, pp. 247-252); and (2) individuativity provides an argument to the best explanation for the claim that belief aims at truth: as the argument goes, without assuming that belief’s truth-directedness has this peculiar individuative role, one cannot account for the difference between beliefs and other attitudes (Engel, 2004; Railton, 1994).

It has also been suggested that if truth-directedness is the distinctive feature of belief with respect to other mental attitudes, this would provide an argument for the claim that this property is also constitutive of belief (Lynch, 2009b, 81; McHugh & Whiting, 2014; Velleman, 2000a; Wedgwood, 2002). Here is a way in which this argument may proceed: if the truth-aim were not a necessary and constitutive feature of belief, it would be possible for a belief not to aim at truth. But then, assuming that the aim is the only feature distinguishing beliefs from other mental attitudes, it would be impossible to classify that attitude as a belief rather than as a different type of attitude. Thus, the truth-aim must be a feature that beliefs possess necessarily and essentially. The argument from individuativity is not the only one supporting the constitutivity of truth-directedness for belief. Since other arguments partially depend on normativist interpretations of the aim, they will be considered in 2.b.

A number of critics have pointed out that it is possible to distinguish beliefs from other types of attitude without stipulating that it involves a constitutive aim at truth. These philosophers identify the attitude of believing a proposition with that of merely holding it true or accepting it (Glüer & Wikforss, 2013; Vahid, 2009), or they take other dispositional or motivational properties of belief as distinctive of this type of attitude. For a discussion of some of these views see §2.c.

b. Differences between the Aim and Other Properties of Belief

According to many philosophers engaged in the present debate (in particular those endorsing teleological and normative interpretations), truth-directedness is supposed to characterize and distinguish belief from other types of mental attitude. This property is conceived of as unique to belief, not possessed by any other attitude. These philosophers are careful to distinguish it from other properties relating belief to truth that other attitudes also possess. In this subsection I will introduce some of these properties and explain in which respects they are supposed to differ from the aim of belief. Mentioning these other properties will provide a rough idea of what truth-directedness is not. However, before considering these properties, it is worth mentioning that some philosophers endorsing minimalist conceptions of truth-directedness tend to identify the aim with some of these properties; these alternative interpretations of the aim will be briefly mentioned in this subsection and considered in more detail in §2.c.

An obvious truth-related feature of belief is the fact that believing something is believing it to be true (Velleman, 2000a). In other words, beliefs have propositions as content, and propositions can be true or false. This property is obviously not individuative of belief, and thus cannot be identified with truth-directedness. All propositional attitudes share it with beliefs. For instance, believing that p is believing that p is true, hoping that p is hoping that p is true, imagining that p is imagining that p is true, and so on (Engel, 2004; Velleman, 2000a).

It is also commonly held that beliefs involve specific causal, functional, and dispositional-motivational roles with respect to action and behavior. Some of these roles determine another aspect under which beliefs are related to truth. Using Ramsey’s (1931) metaphor, beliefs are like maps by which we steer in the world and upon which we are disposed to act. Belief is an attitude involving dispositions to act and behave as if its content were true and to use it as premise in reasoning (Armstrong, 1973; Stalnaker, 1984). Some have argued that belief’s aim at truth can be identified with the possession of similar dispositional and functional properties. In response to this challenge, it has been argued that these properties are not sufficient to set belief apart from other mental attitudes, and thus to capture the distinctive relationship between belief and truth (Engel, 2004; Velleman, 2000a). Other types of attitude seem to possess these very same properties. For instance, attitudes like acceptance and pretense all seem to dispose the subject to act as if their content were true and have the same motivational role.

Another property commonly attributed to belief, and concerning the way it is related to truth, is its mind-to-world direction of fit. On the one hand, some attitudes, like desires, have a world-to-mind direction of fit: if what is desired is not the case, the world should be changed in order to fit what is desired, and not vice versa. On the other hand, other attitudes, like beliefs, have a mind-to-world direction of fit: if what is believed is not the case (that is, it does not fit what it is supposed to represent), the belief’s contents should be revised to fit the world, and not vice versa. This is only one way of fleshing out the distinction (see Frost, 2014 and Humberstone, 1992 for overviews of the distinction). Another popular way is to distinguish between cognitive and conative states, where cognitive states are such that the proposition in their content is regarded as something that is true, while conative states are such that they involve regarding the proposition in the content as something to be made true (Velleman, 2000a). It is difficult to evaluate the relation of the truth-directedness of belief with direction of fit, since this depends on which account of direction of fit one accepts, and there is no unique and undisputed account. Some philosophers seem to identify belief’s direction of fit with its aim at truth (Humberstone, 1992; Platts, 1979). Others (Engel, 2004; Shah & Velleman, 2005; Velleman, 2000a) distinguish the two features, arguing that other mental attitudes such as suppositions, assumptions, and imagining possess the same direction of fit as beliefs, and thus this property cannot be identified with truth-directedness, which is distinctive of beliefs. Notice that the persuasiveness of this argument depends on whether one endorses an account of direction of fit according to which other attitudes would have the same direction of fit as belief.

It is also important to distinguish the truth-directedness of belief from the value of possessing true beliefs. It has been argued that having true beliefs is something valuable (David, 2005; Horwich, 2006; Kvanvig, 2003; Lynch, 2004). We naturally prefer to have true rather than false beliefs, and tend to attribute some sort of value to true beliefs and disvalue to false ones. It seems to be a platitude that true beliefs are at least extrinsically and instrumentally valuable. For example, we might prefer true beliefs to false ones because the former are more conducive to the satisfaction of one’s desires and the avoidance of dangers. Some philosophers have argued that true beliefs have also epistemic value. For example, it has been argued that believing the truth is an intrinsically valuable cognitive success. Though one might expect there to be important connections between the two topics, the issue of whether true beliefs are valuable must be distinguished from the further issue of whether truth is the aim of belief. While the former is a matter of aims, goals, and evaluations extrinsic to the notion of belief (for example, the goal of believing truths and not believing falsehoods), the latter is a property intrinsic and constitutive of such a mental state (Vahid, 2006, 2009, p. 19). Another respect in which the two features must be distinguished is that the value of true beliefs is hardly individuative of beliefs: other types of mental state such as guesses, hypotheses, and conjectures are evaluable according to their being true or false. In spite of these important differences, some philosophers have suggested that the value of true beliefs can be at least in part related to and explained by the constitutive aim of belief, even if not identified with it (Engel, 2004; Lynch, 2004 Railton, 1994; Williams, 2002).

c. The Explanatory Role of the Aim

The hypothesis that beliefs involve an aim at truth has been used to explain a number of features specific to this mental attitude. Before considering such features, it is important to stress that not everyone who endorses some version of this hypothesis thinks that it can explain all of these features. The main features supposed to be explained by truth-directedness are the following:

  • The difficulty or impossibility of believing at will,
  • The infelicity of asserting Moorean sentences and the absurdity of having Moorean beliefs,
  • The normativity of mental content,
  • The motivational force of evidential considerations in deliberative contexts,
  • The nature of epistemic normativity and the norms governing belief and theoretical reasoning, and
  • The correctness standard of belief.

(1) As famously argued by Williams (1973), belief’s truth-aim would enable one to explain the difficulty of believing at will (see also Velleman, 2000a). Believing a proposition p at will would entail believing it without regard to whether p is true. However, if beliefs constitutively involve aiming at truth, the only considerations relevant to forming and maintaining a belief would be those in conformity to its constitutive aim; that is, truth-relevant considerations. Believing at will would thus be either impossible or very difficult. This line of argument has been widely discussed in the literature. For critical discussions see, for example, Frankish (2007); Hieronymi (2006); Setiya (2008); and Yamada (2012).

(2) Belief’s truth-directedness could also explain the infelicity of asserting Moorean sentences and the absurdity of thinking Moorean thoughts—sentences and thoughts having the form “I believe that p, but not p” (for example, Baldwin, 2007; Littlejohn, 2010; Millar, 2009; Moran, 1997; Railton, 1994). Though these sentences are not self-contradictory, if asserted, they sound odd and infelicitous. As Moore (1942, p. 543) observes, this feature of belief-ascription seems to show that self-ascribing a belief in the first person carries with it an implied claim to the truth of the believed proposition. Similar ascriptions relative to many other mental states involve either no infelicity (there is no paradox in asserting “I assume that p but it is false that p”) or a contradiction (it is contradictory to assert “I know that p but it is false that p”). The infelicity of asserting Moorean sentences can be explained as follows: on the one hand, an assertion is an act by which the speaker commits herself to the truth of what she says; on the other hand, a belief is a mental state involving an aim at the truth of the believed proposition. We can also think of this aim as a sort of commitment (Baldwin, 2007; Millar, 2009; see §2.a for normative interpretations of the aim). The infelicity would thus be due to a conflict between the respective constitutive commitments or aims of assertion and belief. By asserting a Moorean sentence like “p and I do not believe that p,” a speaker would both endorse a commitment to the truth of p and deny such a commitment at the same time. This explanation can be easily extended to an explanation of the unreasonableness of Moorean thoughts and judgments, since a judgment, like an assertion, can be considered an act involving a commitment to the truth of what is adjudged.

(3) Many philosophers argue that mental content is normative (for an overview and references, see Glüer & Wikforss, 2010). This thesis is often interpreted as the claim that there are norms governing the correct use of concepts in the content of propositional mental attitudes. An example of such norms is, for instance, that the concept white is correctly applied to an object x if and only if x is white. Some have suggested that the aim of belief can provide an explanation of the normativity of mental content. In particular, Velleman (2000a) has suggested that the normativity of content can be entirely reduced to the truth-directedness of belief: if there is a norm governing mental content, this norm applies only to the contents of attitudes that aim at truth; that is, to beliefs. Boghossian (2003) has provided an argument according to which the normativity of mental content would derive from that of belief. First, he argues that the truth-directedness of belief has to be conceived as a norm constitutive of the concept of belief. Second, he argues that there is a constitutive connection between the notions of content and belief: our grasp of the concept of content depends on the grasp of the concept of belief. The normativity of content would thus be inherited by the normativity of belief. This argument has been the target of several criticisms; see, in particular, Glüer & Wikforss (2009) and Miller (2008).

(4) Belief’s truth-directedness has also been invoked to explain certain aspects of doxastic deliberation (namely deliberation concerning what to believe). One such aspect is the motivational force of evidential considerations in deliberative contexts. In particular, Shah (2003) and Shah and Velleman (2005) have argued that truth-directedness can explain doxastic transparency, the phenomenon according to which, in the context of doxastic deliberation, the question whether to believe that p is invariably settled by the answer to the further question whether p is true. Roughly, the idea is that when an agent engages in deliberation whether to believe a given proposition, only evidential (truth-regarding) considerations can be treated as reasons for believing. Other types of considerations (for example, practical) have no motivational force in the deliberation. This can be explained by the hypothesis that the concept of belief is constitutively governed by a norm to believe p only if p is true, and that in doxastic deliberation, the agent deploying that concept in the question whether to believe that p is motivated by the truth-norm to form a belief only if it is true. This in turn explains why only truth-relevant considerations matter in answering the question. Other philosophers have provided similar explanations of doxastic transparency—and more generally of the central role of evidence in deliberative belief-formation processes—compatible with non-normative interpretations of the truth-aim (for example, Steglich-Petersen, 2006, §5). It is worth noting here that similar explanations of the impossibility of believing in response to non-evidential considerations can also be used to explain the impossibility of believing at will (see (1) above).

(5) Belief’s aim has also been invoked to explain the various norms governing belief and theoretical reasoning, and to shed light on the nature of epistemic normativity in general. For example, according to Velleman, belief’s truth-directedness accounts for the justificatory force of theoretical reasoning. Theoretical reasoning justifies a belief by adducing considerations that indicate it to be true (2000a, p. 246). This is the case because being true is what satisfies the aim of belief. Other philosophers have argued that belief’s aim helps to explain norms of rationality and justification governing beliefs, and, more generally, the nature of epistemic normativity (Boghossian, 2003; Millar, 2004, 2009; Shah & Velleman, 2005; Sosa, 2007; Wedgwood, 2002, 2013). A common explanation takes these norms as instrumentally conducive to the satisfaction of the constitutive truth-aim of belief. This approach to epistemic normativity is not new in the literature. Many philosophers of the past have argued that epistemic standards of justification and rationality would be derivable from the fundamental goal of believing truly and avoiding falsehoods (for an overview see Alston, 2005, chs. 1 and 2). Criticisms of this type of approach to epistemic normativity typically mirror arguments against similar approaches in the practical domain. See, for example, Berker (2013); Firth (1981); Kelly (2003); and Maitzen (1995).

The various attempts to reduce or explain epistemic normativity in terms of a fundamental aim or norm of truth governing belief are considered by some philosophers as part of a wider project directed at providing analogous accounts for other normative domains. In particular, some have argued that practical normativity can be tracked back to constitutive norms of action and agency, which in turn would determine derivative norms of practical rationality and justification (Korsgaard, 1996; Shah, 2008; Velleman, 2000a; Wedgwood, 2007).

(6) According to some philosophers, the aim at truth would also explain why a belief is correct if and only if it is true, that is, the so-called correctness standard of belief (Steglich-Petersen, 2006, 2009; Velleman, 2000a). Philosophers endorsing teleological interpretations of the aim hold that the standard would be an instrumental assessment indicating the measure of success that a belief must attain in order to achieve its constitutive aim. However, this thesis is the subject of major disagreements. Philosophers giving normative interpretations of truth-directedness either identify the correctness standard with the constitutive aim of belief (Engel, 2007; Wedgwood, 2002), or argue for the independence of the two (Shah & Velleman, 2005).

2. Interpretations of the Aim

In the contemporary debate, there is a wide disagreement on how to interpret the claim that belief aims at truth. There are two main interpretations of the aim: teleological and normativist. According to teleological accounts, the aim of belief is an intentional purpose of subjects holding beliefs, or a functional goal of cognitive systems regulating the formation, maintenance, and revision of beliefs. Normativist accounts hold that the claim that beliefs have an aim must be interpreted metaphorically. According to normativists, truth-directedness is better understood as a commitment, a norm governing the regulation of beliefs (their formation, maintenance, and revision). Other philosophers have endorsed minimalist accounts of truth-directedness, denying that beliefs aim at truth in a substantive sense.

a. Teleological Interpretations

Teleological (also called “teleologist”) interpretations hold that beliefs are literally directed at truth as an aim, an end, or a goal (telos in Greek). This aim would be realized in truth-conducive processes and practices of belief-regulation, whose role is the formation, maintenance, and revision of beliefs. An attitude would count as a belief only if it is formed and regulated by these processes and practices. An advantage commonly attributed to teleological interpretations is that these interpretations seem more compatible with a naturalistic account of belief than rival interpretations (in particular, normativist ones). The thought is that intentions, goals, or functions can be accounted for in naturalistic terms. Furthermore, this interpretation would naturally fit with broadly instrumentalist, naturalistically unproblematic conceptions of epistemic normativity and epistemic rationality (note however that these conceptions have been the target of many criticisms; for example, Berker, 2013; Kelly, 2003).

Teleological interpretations differ with respect to how they conceive the aim at truth. Some teleologists interpret the aim of belief as an intentional goal of the subject, like an interest to accept a proposition only if it is true. For example, according to Steglich-Petersen (2006), believing is accepting a proposition with the purpose of getting its truth-value right. According to such an interpretation, the aim is realized through deliberative practices like judgments, in which an agent accepts a proposition only if she has evidence in support of its truth, and maintains that acceptance in the absence of contrary evidence. Steglich-Petersen recognizes that many of our beliefs are regulated in entirely sub-intentional ways. However, he argues that only beliefs considered at an intentional level are connected to a literal aim:

cognitive states and processes that are not connected with any literal aim or intention of a believer can nevertheless count as ‘beliefs’ in virtue of […] being to some degree conducive to the hypothetical aim of someone intending to form a belief in the primary strong sense. (2006, p. 515)

Other philosophers have advanced sub-intentional interpretations of the aim, conceiving it as a functional goal of the attitude or the psychological system to form true beliefs and revise false ones. This function would be regulated at a sub-personal, often unconscious level. A similar approach has been defended by Bird (2007) and McHugh (2012b). Some authors also interpret certain functionalist accounts such as those of Burge (2003), Millikan (1984), and Plantinga (1993) as teleological in this sense (see, for example, McHugh, 2012a, fn. 6, 2012b, fn. 49).

The most popular interpretation of the aim is a “mixed” one, according to which truth-directedness would be constituted by both intentional and sub-intentional processes. In particular, Velleman (2000a) maintains that there is a broad spectrum of ways in which the aim can be regulated. While sometimes it is realized in the intentional aim of a subject in an act of judgment about a certain matter, at other times there are cognitive systems in charge of the regulation of belief designed to ensure the truth of such mental states. Such systems would carry out this function more or less automatically, not relying on the subject’s intentions. Other philosophers who distinguish between intentional and sub-personal levels of regulation of the aim are Millar (2004, ch.2); Sosa (2007, 2009).

A well-known objection to teleological accounts, provided by Owens (2003), is specifically directed at intentional and mixed interpretations of the aim (for similar objections see Kelly, 2003). Owens observes that if beliefs aim at truth as argued by teleologists, believing would be similar to guessing. Guesses are mental acts aiming at truth, in the sense that when one guesses, one strives to give the true answer to a question. As Owens writes,

a guesser intends to guess truly. The aim of a guess is to get it right: a successful guess is a true guess and a false guess is a failure as a guess. Someone who does not intend to guess truly is not really guessing. (2003, p. 290)

 According to a teleologist perspective, similar considerations are valid for belief, which is a mental state held with the purpose of holding it only if true. But there are at least two important disanalogies between the intentional aim involved in guessing and the aim of belief.

First, the aim of belief does not interact with other aims of the subject the way the truth-aim of guesses does. The aim of guessing (as well as that of other goal-directed activities) can interact with other goals and objectives of the subject, it can conflict with these other goals, and it can be weighed with them. In particular, when we guess, we integrate the truth-aim constitutive of guessing with other purposes, such as the practical relevance of guessing, and we consider guessing that p reasonable when aiming at the truth by means of a guess that p would maximize expected utility (Owens, 2003, p. 292). If beliefs, like guesses, constitutively involve an aim at truth, then we should expect that, on at least some occasions, we would weigh the aim of belief against other aims. For example, when engaged in deliberation about whether to believe a given proposition, our pursuit of the truth-goal may be constrained by other goals and purposes of the subject in the usual way. But belief’s aim does not work like this. A large reward to believe that today it is not sunny gives me a reason to try to believe it, but, in deliberation about what to believe, these considerations do not interact and cannot be weighed with the truth-aim of belief in the way they do with other aims and purposes of the subject. In this respect, belief appears to be “insulated” from all but one aim, in a way that aim-directed behaviors in general are not (McHugh, 2012a, p. 430).

The second disanalogy suggested by Owens is that, in guessing, we can exercise a kind of voluntary control that is not possible in the case of belief. The guesser can compare different considerations and then decide whether to terminate her inquiry and guess. Nothing similar happens in deliberation about whether to believe a given proposition, where one cannot decide when to conclude her inquiry and start believing a proposition. The deliberation is concluded more or less automatically and cannot be controlled by reflection on how best to achieve the aim. Given these disanalogies, Owens concludes that while a guess is an attitude regulated by an intentional aim at truth, belief is not.

Teleologists have provided some replies to Owen’s argument. In particular, it has been argued that the aim of belief does in fact interact and can be weighed with other aims (Steglich-Petersen, 2009); it has been denied that evidential considerations play the exclusively prominent role in belief-formation suggested by Owen’s argument (McHugh, 2012a; for a similar point, though not directly related to Owen's argument, see Frankish, 2007); and it has been argued that the direct form of control we have on the formation of guesses, but not of beliefs, can be explained by the fact that belief is a mental state, while guessing is a mental act (Shah & Velleman, 2005).

A related problem for a teleological interpretation of the aim is that sometimes we are completely indifferent to certain matters, and sometimes we even prefer (have the goal or aim) not to have any belief on certain matters. Nevertheless, evidence for these truths constitutes reasons for us to believe them, and if presented with such evidence in normal circumstances, we cannot refrain from forming beliefs on these matters. This seems to show that truth-directedness, and more generally epistemic rationality, cannot be reduced to aim-directed activities in the common sense of the term (Kelly, 2003).

Another very popular argument against teleological accounts of truth-directedness is Shah’s (2003) “teleologist’s dilemma”. The dilemma relies on the following observation: on the one hand, in practices of doxastic deliberation—deliberation directed at forming a belief about a certain matter—considerations concerning the evidence in support of the truth of a given proposition are the only ones that are relevant in order to answer the question whether to believe that proposition (this is what Shah calls the phenomenon of doxastic transparency; compare §1.c). On the other hand, some belief-formation processes can be influenced by non-evidential factors (for example, cases of wishful thinking). In an attempt to explain these two types of belief formation, the teleologist is pushed in two incompatible directions: she can consider the truth-aim as a disposition so weak as to allow cases in which beliefs are caused by non-evidential processes, in which case she cannot account for the exclusive influence of evidential considerations in deliberative contexts of belief-formation; alternatively, in order to account for the exclusive role of evidence in doxastic deliberation, she can strengthen the disposition that constitutes aiming at truth so that it excludes the influence of non-truth-regarding considerations from such kinds of reasoning—but then she cannot accommodate non-deliberative cases in which non-evidential factors influence belief-formation. In either case, the teleologist cannot explain the truth-regulation of belief in both deliberative and non-deliberative contexts. Therefore, a teleologist interpretation of the aim is not sufficient alone to provide an explanation for the truth-directedness of beliefs in all processes of belief formation.

In order to address this problem, Shah & Velleman (2005) argue that belief is regulated by two levels of truth-directedness: a sub-intentional teleological mechanism responsible for weak regulation in non-deliberative contexts, and one conceived in normative terms, able to explain the strong truth-regulation in deliberative contexts (see §2.b). For accounts of the dilemma compatible with a teleologist perspective, see, for example, Steglich-Petersen (2006) and Toribio (2013). For other objections to the teleological account, see Engel (2004) and Zalabardo (2010).

b. Normative Interpretations

Another way of interpreting belief’s truth-directedness has been through normative terms. According to normativist accounts of the aim of belief, the claim that “belief aims at truth” is just a metaphorical way of expressing the thought that beliefs are constitutively governed by a norm prescribing (or permitting) one to believe the truth (or only the truth). For example, if Mary forms the belief that it is now 12 a.m., she does what the norm requires (that is, she possesses a right belief) if that proposition is true, and she violates the norm if that proposition is false. Many normativists identify the norm of belief with a standard of correctness:

(C) a belief is correct if and only if the believed proposition is true

These philosophers take this standard to be constitutive of the essence or the concept of belief: belief would be a mental state characterized by the fact of being correct if and only if it is true (see §1.a for more details on normativist interpretations of the constitutivity thesis). This interpretation of the aim is probably the most popular in the early 21st century. It has been defended by, among others, Boghossian (2003); Engel (2004, 2013); Gibbard (2005); Millar (2004); Shah (2003); Wedgwood (2002, 2007, 2013).

Let us here clarify a common confusion about the claim that belief is constitutively governed by a norm: that a truth-norm constitutively governs belief does not mean that all beliefs necessarily satisfy that norm. What is constitutive of belief is not the satisfaction of the norm (as a matter of fact, many beliefs happen to be false, and thus incorrect), but that the norm is in force and believers and their beliefs can be assessed and criticized according to it—as correct if the belief is true, and incorrect if it is false.

One of the best known arguments for a normative interpretation of truth-directedness, suggested by Shah (2003), is the argument to the best explanation of doxastic transparency. As mentioned in §2.a, transparency is the (alleged) phenomenon according to which the deliberative question whether to believe a given proposition p is invariably settled by answering the further question whether it is true that p. The two questions are answerable to the same set of considerations; that is, considerations concerning the evidence for or against the truth of p. This phenomenon is specific to deliberative contexts in which an agent explicitly considers whether to believe a given proposition. In such contexts, only evidential (truth-relevant) considerations can influence belief-formation. In contexts in which a subject forms a belief without passing through a deliberative process, on the contrary, non-evidential considerations could influence the belief-formation.

According to Shah, only a normative interpretation of the aim of belief can explain these facts—doxastic transparency, why this phenomenon is specific to doxastic deliberation, and the exclusive role of evidential considerations in deliberative contexts. The explanation is the following: let us assume that it is constitutive of the concept of belief that a belief is correct if and only if it is true. This is interpreted as the claim that someone believing a proposition p is under a normative commitment to believe p only if it is true. When a subject engages in doxastic deliberation and asks herself whether to believe a given proposition, she deploys the concept of belief. Assuming she understands this concept and is aware of its application conditions, she interprets this question as whether to form a mental attitude that she should have only if the proposition is true. This in turn determines a disposition to be moved only by considerations relevant to the truth of p. This explains transparency and the exclusive role of evidential considerations in deliberative contexts. In contrast, in non-deliberative contexts where belief-formation works at a sub-intentional level, the subject does not explicitly consider the question whether to believe p, does not deploy the concept of belief, and is not thereby motivated by the norm to regard only truth-relevant considerations as relevant in the process of belief-formation. For this reason, non-evidential factors can influence belief-formation in these contexts. In sum, Shah’s normativist account allows him to explain both the strong role of truth in the belief regulation in deliberative contexts, and its weak role in non-deliberative ones.

An objection to Shah’s argument is that it assumes an implausibly strong form of motivational internalism according to which the norm of belief necessarily and immediately motivates the agent when she recognizes and accepts it. This contrasts with the ways in which, in general, norms tend to motivate agents (McHugh, 2013; Steglich-Petersen, 2006).

Another argument for a normativist account of truth-directedness, suggested by Wedgwood (2002), is composed of two steps. First, it is argued that the correctness standard of belief expresses a relation of strong supervenience (correctness of a belief strongly supervenes on the truth of that belief’s content). The standard thereby articulates a necessary feature of belief: necessarily, all true beliefs are correct and all false beliefs are incorrect. Second, since the standard articulates a necessary feature of belief, it is an essential feature of beliefs. Both steps of the argument have been criticized (for example, Steglich-Petersen, 2008, pp. 277-278). Against the second step, one cannot infer from a thing necessarily possessing a certain property to the property being essential to the thing it is a property of—using a well-known example of Fine (1994, pp. 4-5), one cannot infer from the necessary claim that Socrates is the only member of the singleton having as its only member Socrates to the claim that it is essential to Socrates that he is the only member of that singleton. Against the first step, it has been argued that it relies on contentious assumptions about normative supervenience: it is an error to deduce from the supervenience of a normative property N over a non-normative property G the necessity of the claim that every object having property G also has property N. The most one can conclude is that, necessarily, if some object has property N in virtue of having property G, then anything with property G also has property N (where necessity here takes a wide scope on the conditional). For similar considerations on normative relations of supervenience, see Blackburn (1993, p. 132); and Steglich-Petersen (2008).

Other arguments often used in support of the normativist interpretation do not clearly favor this interpretation over alternative substantive conceptions of truth-directedness, such as teleological ones. For example, it has been argued that unless one assumes that belief is constitutively governed by a truth-norm, one is not in a position to distinguish beliefs from other cognitive propositional attitudes, such as assuming, thinking, or imagining. The assumption that belief is constitutively governed by a truth-norm has also been used in arguments to the best explanation of a number of features of belief such as (1) the infelicity of asserting Moorean sentences; (2) the disposition to rely on a believed proposition as a reason for action and a premise in practical reasoning (Baldwin, 2007, p. 83); and (3) the relation between belief, assertion, evidence, and action (Griffiths, 1962). See §1.c for discussion of some of these arguments. These various arguments have received formulations both in normativist and teleological terms (for teleological formulations, simply replace occurrences of “truth-norm” with “truth-aim”); for this reason, they do not favor either interpretation. It is also worth mentioning that the claim that belief is constitutively normative has received indirect support from views that, for independent reasons, hold that intentional attitudes in general are constitutively normative (Brandom, 1994; Millar, 2004; Wedgwood, 2007).

Though the normativist interpretation has been the most popular in the last two decades, it has also been the target of several criticisms. According to the No Guidance Argument, a truth-norm is incapable of guiding an agent in the formation and revision of her beliefs. One can conform one’s beliefs to a norm requiring one to believe only true propositions only by first forming beliefs about whether these propositions are true. The only way to follow this norm will thus be continuing to believe what one already believes. Such a norm would not provide any guidance as to what a subject should do in order to comply with it. More precisely, this norm would have no guiding role in processes of belief regulation (formation, maintenance, and revision). Versions of this argument have been given by Glüer & Wikforss (2009, pp. 44-45); Horwich (2006, p. 354); and Mayo (1963, p. 141). A reply to this argument consists in arguing that even if the truth-norm does not provide any direct guidance, it can guide belief regulation indirectly, via some other derived principle like norms of evidence and rationality (Boghossian, 2003; Wedgwood, 2002); or it could guide in specific contexts, such as in doxastic deliberation where an agent explicitly considers her evidence for a given proposition p with the aim of making up her mind about whether p (Shah & Velleman, 2005). For a further defense of the argument see Glüer & Wikforss (2010b, 2013).

Another criticism of the normative interpretation is that, in general, an agent subject to a norm should have some form of intentional control over the actions necessary to satisfy it and be free to choose whether to conform to the norm or not. These conditions on control and freedom to comply seem to be constraints on norms in general. However, belief formation is (at least often) an involuntary process and is realized at an automatic, non-inferential level. It is thus unclear how a truth-norm governing belief can satisfy the above constraints. For versions of this objection, see Glüer & Wikforss (2009); and Steglich-Petersen (2006).

Another problem for normative interpretations of truth-directedness concerns the formulation of the alleged norm of belief. If beliefs are constitutively governed by a truth-norm, it should be possible to state this norm in terms of some duty, prescription, or permission. However, all the suggested formulations seem to be affected by some problem. Bykvist and Hattiangadi (2007), in particular, consider several possible formulations of the norm and conclude that none of them is free from problems. The best known formulations are the following:

(1) For any S, p: S ought to (believe that p) iff p

(2) For any S, p: if S ought to (believe that p), then p

(3) For any S, p: S ought to (believe that p iff p)

All these formulations are flawed in some way. (1) implies that one ought to believe every true proposition, included trivial and uninteresting ones (see also Sosa, 2003 for a similar point). Furthermore, provided there are true propositions that it is impossible to believe (for example, it is raining and nobody believes that it is raining), (1) violates the commonly accepted rule according to which “ought” implies “can.” (2) seems not to be normatively interesting because it is unable to place any requirement on believers—if p is true, nothing follows from it about what S ought to believe; and if p is false, it only follows that it is not the case that S ought to believe that p; it does not follow that S ought not to believe that p. (3) is problematic for it does not allow one to derive claims about what one ought or ought not to believe. For example, from (3) and the falsity of p, one cannot derive that one ought not to believe p. Furthermore, (3) seems to be subject to the same objections raised against (1).

Bykvist and Hattiangadi raise similar objections to other formulations of the truth-norm. From this, they conclude that this general failure could be considered a clue that belief is not at all a normative concept, at least not in the way suggested by normativists. Many have considered this conclusion too hasty. First, even if all the available formulations of the norm are wrong, this does not mean that it is impossible to formulate the norm of belief in “ought” terms; it could simply mean that the right formulation is yet to come. Second, some have suggested alternative formulations that seem to avoid the above problems. For example, Whiting (2010) has suggested that interpreting the truth-norm as a norm of permissibility could avoid most of the problems. Other formulations avoiding these problems have been suggested by Littlejohn (2010), Fassio (2011), and Raleigh (2013). For a discussion, see Bykvist and Hattiangadi (2013). A third way of avoiding these objections is to deny that the norm of belief is a truth-norm (see §3).

A reply to the various considered objections to normative interpretations consists in abandoning a deontic conception of the truth-norm, according to which the norm would be like a prescription, directive, or permission. Adopting alternative non-deontic interpretations of the norm would allow one to avoid the various objections considered above. Some have suggested interpreting the normativity of belief in evaluative terms; that is, in terms of what it is good (in a certain sense of “good” to be specified) to believe (Fassio, 2011; McHugh, 2012b). Others have interpreted the norm of belief as involving a type of normativity sui generis (McHugh, 2014; Rosen, 2001, p. 621), as an ideal of reason (Engel, 2013), or as an “ought to be” in the Sellarsian sense, not requiring addressees of the norm to be capable of voluntarily following it (Chrisman, 2008).

For other criticisms of normativist interpretations of truth-directedness, see also Davidson (2001); Dretske (2000); Horwich (2006, 2013); and Papineau (1999, 2013). The common factor in these criticisms is the defense of the thesis that if there are norms governing beliefs, these are practical, contingent, and not constitutive of belief. Replies to some of the above objections are in Engel (2007, 2013); Shah & Velleman (2005); and Wedgwood (2013).

c. Minimalist Interpretations

The label “minimalist interpretations” is used here for a range of different views. The common factor of these views is that they deny that there is such a property as a truth-aim of belief, at least if one identifies it with some feature different from those considered in §1.b. Minimalists hold that the features supposedly explained by the aim of belief (see §1.c) can be explained by other properties commonly ascribed to these mental states, such as their causal, dispositional, functional, or motivational roles, or their direction of fit (Davidson, 2001; Dretske, 2000; Papineau, 1999).

Given the present characterization, one may wonder whether there is a clear-cut dividing line between teleological and minimalist views; in particular, between sub-intentional teleological views, identifying the aim at truth with functional mechanisms of the cognitive system, and dispositionalist and functionalist minimalist accounts. A way of distinguishing these two approaches is by looking at the dispositional or functional role distinctive of belief (compare McHugh, 2012a, fn. 6): while functionalist accounts congenial to teleological approaches to the truth-aim focus on the input side of belief’s functional role, and exclusively identify this role with a truth-directed goal (for example, forming true beliefs), minimalists think that the role that individuates belief is at least partially on the output side, and they are mainly concerned with practical roles of belief, such as satisfying the subject’s desires or providing reasons for action.

Some philosophers have endorsed accounts of belief according to which causal, dispositional, and/or functional roles of beliefs with respect to action and behavior would be sufficient to characterize and individuate this type of mental attitude. Some have argued that the specific relation between belief and truth can be fully explained by the functional role of beliefs of providing reasons for action. Others have argued that all that is necessary for an attitude to qualify as a belief is that it dispose the subject to behave in ways that would promote the satisfaction of his desires if its content were true. For similar views see, for example, Stalnaker (1984). Armstrong (1973) argues that an essential function of beliefs is moving a subject to action given the presence of suitable dominant desires and purposes, and locates in this causal role the peculiar difference between belief and other mental attitudes such as mere thoughts. Still others have identified the aim at truth of belief with its direction of fit (Humberstone, 1992; Platts, 1979).

A “deflationary” interpretation of truth-directedness has been defended by Vahid (2006, 2009). Vahid first considers the feature of accepting-as-true, introduced by Velleman (2000a), as common to all cognitive states (beliefs, assumptions, conjectures, imaginations…). He suggests that to capture the truth-directedness of belief, one should not add any further (teleological or normative) property to the fact that belief is an attitude of regarding-as-true. Rather, what is distinctive of belief according to Vahid is the specific way in which one regards-as-true a given proposition. While other attitudes involve regarding a proposition as true for the sake of something else, in order to reach certain specific goals (for example, assuming is regarding-as-true for the sake of argument, imagining involves regarding a proposition as true for motivational purposes), believing is regarding a proposition as true for its own sake, as an end in itself.

The main criticism directed at minimalist interpretations is that other mental states such as suppositions and assumptions possess these same properties (same causal, functional, dispositional, and motivational roles; same direction of fit) and, thus, that these properties are not sufficient alone to individuate the peculiar truth-directedness of belief, to explain the special features of belief listed in §1.c, and to distinguish beliefs from other types of mental attitude (Engel, 2004; Velleman, 2000a). For a reply, see, for instance, Zalabardo (2010, §10), who challenges the claim that a purely motivational conception of belief would not be sufficient to distinguish beliefs from other mental attitudes. See also Glüer & Wikforss (2009, p. 42).

3. What Does Belief Aim At?

There is debate concerning whether the aim of belief is truth, as has been traditionally argued, or some other property. Since the late 1990s, an increasing number of philosophers have defended the claim that knowledge is the fundamental aim or norm of belief. Upholders of this view are, among others, Adler (2002); Bird (2007); Huemer (2007); Littlejohn (2013); Peacocke (1999); Sutton (2007); and Williamson (2000). The best known defender of the thesis that belief would aim at knowledge is Williamson (2000). Williamson’s main motivations to hold this thesis derive from his view about the nature of knowledge and its relation to belief. Williamson criticizes the idea that it is possible to provide an analysis of knowledge in terms of other more fundamental notions. Rather, other epistemic notions such as belief and justification should be understood as derivative from the more fundamental notion of knowledge—this is the so-called Knowledge First approach in epistemology. In particular, Williamson suggests that belief be considered roughly as the attitude of treating a proposition as if one knew it. Knowledge would thus fix the standard of appropriateness or the success condition for a belief, and merely believing p without knowing it would be a sort of “botched knowing.” (2000, p. 47). In this sense, belief would not aim merely at truth but at knowledge.

A well-known argument for the knowledge aim is based on a parallel between assertion and belief (compare also “Knowledge Norms,” §3.a. On the one side, many have argued that assertion is constitutively governed by a knowledge norm (Adler, 2002; Bird, 2007; Sutton, 2007; Williamson, 2000):

(KNA) one should assert p only if one knows p.

On the other hand, some philosophers have suggested that occurrent belief is the inner analogue of assertion (for example, Williamson, 2000, pp. 255-256). More precisely, the idea is that (flat-out) assertion is the verbal counterpart of a judgment, and a judgment is a form of occurrent (outright) belief. If so, it is plausible that assertion and belief are governed by the same norm, and knowledge would be the norm of belief too:

(KNB) one should believe p only if one knows p.

Similar arguments have been suggested by Adler (2002); Bird (2007); McHugh (2011); Sosa (2010, p. 48); Sutton (2007); and Williamson (2000). To this line of argument, it may be objected that knowledge is not the norm of assertion. Some philosophers have suggested counterexamples to this thesis (Brown 2008; Lackey 2007). Others have argued that assertion is governed by other norms such as truth or justification (Douven, 2006; Weiner, 2005). Another way to criticize this argument consists in challenging the similarity between belief and assertion, arguing in particular that they would not be governed by the same norms. Whiting (2013, pp. 187-188) provides some reasons why one should expect standards of belief and assertion to diverge: since assertion is an “external” act, involving a social dimension, in evaluating an assertion one might have to take into account the expectations and needs of interlocutors and the role of speech acts in the unfolding conversation. Furthermore, assertion is a potential source of testimony. In asserting, one takes on responsibility for others’ beliefs. All these considerations are extraneous to belief, which is a “private” state of mind. It would thus not be surprising if assertions were governed by more demanding epistemic standards than belief due to their social character and their communicative role. Brown (2012, pp. 137-144) provides another argument against the claim that assertion and belief share the same epistemic standard: she first argues that whether an assertion or belief is epistemically appropriate partially depends on its consequences (for example, the epistemic propriety of asserting varies with the stakes), and second, that the consequences of asserting p may differ from those of believing p. It follows that there can be cases in which it is epistemically appropriate for a subject to believe that p, but not to assert that p, and vice versa.

Considerations about versions of Moore’s paradox with “know” in place of “belief” provide another argument for the claim that knowledge is the aim or norm of belief (Adler, 2002; Gibbons, 2013; Huemer, 2007; Sutton, 2007). As it sounds absurd or infelicitous to assert sentences like “it is raining but I do not know it is raining,” it seems incoherent to believe that it is raining and at the same time that one does not know that it is raining. An explanation of this fact could be that knowledge is the aim or norm of belief. A subject believing that it is raining but that she does not know it would violate (KNB). This type of argument has been the target of two objections: first, some have argued that a weaker standard, like a truth-norm, would be sufficient to explain the absurdity of this sort of Moorean belief (see, for example, the explanation considered in §1.c). Second, it has been argued that while asserting Moorean propositions of the form “it is raining but I do not know it is raining” sounds absurd, there is no such absurdity in believing these same propositions. It seems both reasonable and appropriate to believe something even while believing not to know it (McGlynn, 2013; Whiting, 2013, pp. 188-189). Using an example in McGlynn (2013, p. 387), there is nothing unreasonable or incongruous for Jane to believe that her ticket will lose, that this belief is justified, and that nonetheless this belief fails to count as knowledge. A reply to the latter criticism consists in distinguishing between outright (or full) belief and partial belief. Only outright belief would be subject to a knowledge norm. For a reply, see McGlynn (2013, §3) and Whiting (2013, p. 189).

Another argument for the knowledge aim/norm of belief is provided by the way in which we tend to assess (justify and criticize) our beliefs. Williamson (2005, p. 109) provides the following case: John is at the zoo and sees what appears to him to be a zebra in a cage. The animal in the cage is really a zebra. However, unbeknownst to John, to save money, most of the other animals in the zoo have been replaced by cleverly disguised farm animals. In this scenario, John’s belief is true and fully reasonable (after all, he has no reason to believe that the animal in the cage could not be a zebra). Still, John does not know it is a zebra. Intuitively, John needs an excuse for believing that the animal is a zebra. He can excuse himself by pointing out that he is in no position to distinguish his state from one of knowing. The need for an excuse indicates that it is wrong for John to believe that the animal is a zebra. Despite the fact that John’s belief is both reasonable and true, it is somewhat defective. This contrasts with knowing that it is a zebra, which provides a full justification for believing it, not a mere excuse. A reply to this argument is that John is not wrong in believing that the animal is a zebra (and thus does not need an excuse for this). Rather, if John stands in need of correction, this is due to the false background beliefs he has—for example, the belief that animals in this area are all zebras (Littlejohn, 2010; Whiting, 2013).

Some philosophers have argued that knowledge is the aim or norm of belief on the ground that knowledge has more value than mere true belief (Bird, 2007). However, on the one hand, there is no general agreement on whether knowledge is more valuable than true belief. On the other hand, from the fact that knowledge is more valuable than true belief, it does not follow that belief is governed by a norm or involves a constitutive aim at knowledge.

For other arguments in support of the claim that the aim or norm of belief is knowledge, see Bird (2007); Engel (2004); McHugh (2011); and Sutton (2007). For other criticisms of the claim, see Littlejohn (2010); McGlynn (2013); and Whiting (2013).

Though truth and knowledge are widely identified as the main candidates for being the aim or norm of belief, some philosophers have suggested other properties. Another available option is that the aim of belief is reasonability or justification. For a defense of the claim that non-factive justification is the condition of epistemic success for belief, see, for example, Feldman (2002, pp. 378-379). It should be noted that this view has not found many proponents in the 21st century literature, at least if we exclude philosophers for whom justified belief is factive or requires knowledge (for example, Gibbons, 2013; Littlejohn, 2012; Sutton, 2007). An original approach is that of Smithies (2012), who argues that the fundamental norm of belief is that one be in a position to know what one believes, where “[o]ne is in a position to know a proposition just in case one satisfies all the epistemic, as opposed to psychological, conditions for knowledge, such as having ungettiered justification to believe a true proposition.” (2012, p. 4)

Some philosophers have identified the aim of belief with some specific kind of epistemic virtue one could manifest in the possession of belief (Zagzebski, 2004) or with understanding (Kvanvig, 2003). According to other philosophers, the fundamental aim of belief consists in the satisfaction of practical goals such as survival, utility, or the satisfaction of desires and wants. Similar views are particularly popular among philosophers favoring naturalistic approaches in the philosophy of mind. For example, Millikan (1984) argues that beliefs are integrated in a naturally selected cognitive system having the function of tracking features of the world in order to help in the satisfaction of biological needs such as survival and reproduction. A similar view has been more or less explicitly endorsed by, for example, Horwich (2006); Kornblith (1993); and Papineau (1999, 2013).

Another option is that belief possesses multiple aims or norms equally fundamental and irreducible to each other. For example, Weiner (2014) endorses pluralism about epistemic norms, arguing that there are many different epistemic norms, each valid from a different standpoint, and that no one of these standpoints need be better than another. In a virtue-theoretic framework, Wright (2014) argues that there are two fundamental epistemic aims: believing in accordance with the intellectual virtues (such as intellectual courage, carefulness, and open-mindedness), and believing the truth and avoiding falsehoods.

4. Relevance of the Topic

The topic discussed in the present article has relevance for several more general philosophical debates. It is clearly relevant in those areas of philosophy directly concerned with the notion of belief, such as the Philosophy of Mind, and in particular, the ontology of mental attitudes. One of the issues that traditionally have most concerned philosophers is that of individuating the distinctive feature of belief with respect to other mental attitudes such as trusting, mere thinking, imagining, guessing, and so on. As David Hume admits (1739, book I, part III, §7), the distinction between belief and mere thought was the first philosophical problem that the Scottish philosopher posed himself, and also one of the hardest he found to solve (for a discussion, see Armstrong, 1973, part I, §5). Whereas the difference between belief and other types of mental attitude seems to reside in the specific relationship that belief entertains with truth (or knowledge), it has been extremely difficult to grasp the peculiar nature of such a relationship. The 21st century debate on the aim of belief promises to provide an answer to such a problem. In answering questions about the nature of the aim (see §2), it also promises to shed some light on the issue of whether belief is a normative attitude or whether it can be characterized by a fully naturalistic account.

The progress in the debate about the aim/norm of belief also substantially contributes to the study of norms and aims of other attitudes such as desires, emotions, and intentions. The aim of such studies is to provide a unified and coherent representation of the various norms and aims of mental attitudes and of their reciprocal relations (for example, Millar, 2009; Railton, 1997; Shah, 2008; Velleman, 2000b; Wedgwood, 2007). For instance, Wedgwood (2007) interprets the aim of attitudes as norms of correctness and argues that similar norms are constitutive and individuative of all intentional attitudes. Similarly, Shah (2008) applies an argument analogous to the transparency argument for belief (considered in §2.b) to other attitudes. In particular, he argues that the hypothesis that the concept of intention is governed by a constitutive norm would best explain the presumed fact that in order to conclude deliberation on whether to intend to A one must answer the question whether to A.

The debate on the aim of belief has, also, a particular relevance for certain views in philosophy of normativity. According to a prominent view in meta-ethics (so-called Constitutivism), normative facts can be grounded in facts about the constitution of action or agency. According to this view, agency is constitutively governed by practical norms (for example, Korsgaard, 1996; Velleman, 2000b). Some philosophers have tried to extend the view to other normative domains such as epistemology and aesthetics. The epistemological analogue of Ethical Constitutivism holds that epistemic normativity can be grounded in the constitutive aim or norm of belief. For a criticism of constitutivist approaches, see Enoch (2006).

The view that epistemic normativity is grounded in a fundamental truth-aim of belief has deep roots in the 20st century history of epistemology. Many philosophers in the past have argued that there is a strict dependence relation between the fundamental aim or norm of belief (sometimes presented as a conjunction of two values or goals of believing truly and avoiding falsehoods) and other derivable normative epistemic standards such as justification and rationality. Versions of this view have been defended by many well-known epistemologists, including Chisholm, Goldman, Lehrer, Plantinga, Alston, Foley, and Sosa (see Alston, 2005, ch. 1, for an overview). Accounts of this relation differ depending on the notions of justification and rationality adopted by philosophers, and by how philosophers conceive the relation between the truth-aim and other derived normative properties (for example, consequentialist, deontologist, virtue-based…).

Another approach in epistemology concerned with the topic of the aim or norm of belief is the so-called Knowledge First approach introduced in §3. According to this view, knowledge has a prominent role among epistemic notions and constitutes the fundamental epistemic standard of assertion, belief, action, practical reasoning, and disagreement (compare “Knowledge Norms”). This approach has generated a comparative study of these standards (for example, Smithies, 2012). An example is the reformulation of various arguments for the knowledge norm of assertion in order to defend other knowledge norms, such as those of belief and action (compare §3). In this perspective, the debate on the aim of belief can help in understanding important aspects of epistemic norms of assertion, action, practical reasoning, and disagreement, and in turn can receive important contributions from advances in the debates about norms governing these other practices.

5. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Davide Fassio
University of Geneva