Jeremy Bentham was an English philosopher and political radical. He is primarily known today for his moral philosophy, especially his principle of utilitarianism, which evaluates actions based upon their consequences. The relevant consequences, in particular, are the overall happiness created for everyone affected by the action. Influenced by many enlightenment thinkers, especially empiricists such as John Locke and David Hume, Bentham developed an ethical theory grounded in a largely empiricist account of human nature. He famously held a hedonistic account of both motivation and value according to which what is fundamentally valuable and what ultimately motivates us is pleasure and pain. Happiness, according to Bentham, is thus a matter of experiencing pleasure and lack of pain.
Although he never practiced law, Bentham did write a great deal of philosophy of law, spending most of his life critiquing the existing law and strongly advocating legal reform. Throughout his work, he critiques various natural accounts of law which claim, for example, that liberty, rights, and so on exist independent of government. In this way, Bentham arguably developed an early form of what is now often called “legal positivism.” Beyond such critiques, he ultimately maintained that putting his moral theory into consistent practice would yield results in legal theory by providing justification for social, political, and legal institutions.
A leading theorist in Anglo-American philosophy of law and one of the founders of utilitarianism, Jeremy Bentham was born in Houndsditch, London on February 15, 1748. He was the son and grandson of attorneys, and his early family life was colored by a mix of pious superstition (on his mother’s side) and Enlightenment rationalism (from his father). Bentham lived during a time of major social, political and economic change. The Industrial Revolution (with the massive economic and social shifts that it brought in its wake), the rise of the middle class, and revolutions in France and America all were reflected in Bentham’s reflections on existing institutions. In 1760, Bentham entered Queen’s College, Oxford and, upon graduation in 1764, studied law at Lincoln’s Inn. Though qualified to practice law, he never did so. Instead, he devoted most of his life to writing on matters of legal reform—though, curiously, he made little effort to publish much of what he wrote.
Bentham spent his time in intense study, often writing some eight to twelve hours a day. While most of his best known work deals with theoretical questions in law, Bentham was an active polemicist and was engaged for some time in developing projects that proposed various practical ideas for the reform of social institutions. Although his work came to have an important influence on political philosophy, Bentham did not write any single text giving the essential principles of his views on this topic. His most important theoretical work is the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1789), in which much of his moral theory—which he said reflected “the greatest happiness principle”—is described and developed.
In 1781, Bentham became associated with the Earl of Shelburne and, through him, came into contact with a number of the leading Whig politicians and lawyers. Although his work was admired by some at the time, Bentham’s ideas were still largely unappreciated. In 1785, he briefly joined his brother Samuel in Russia, where he pursued his writing with even more than his usual intensity, and he devised a plan for the now infamous “Panopticon”—a model prison where all prisoners would be observable by (unseen) guards at all times—a project which he had hoped would interest the Czarina Catherine the Great. After his return to England in 1788, and for some 20 years thereafter, Bentham pursued—fruitlessly and at great expense—the idea of the panopticon. Fortunately, an inheritance received in 1796 provided him with financial stability. By the late 1790s, Bentham’s theoretical work came to have a more significant place in political reform. Still, his influence was, arguably, still greater on the continent. (Bentham was made an honorary citizen of the fledgling French Republic in 1792, and his The Theory of Legislation was published first, in French, by his Swiss disciple, Etienne Dumont, in 1802.)
The precise extent of Bentham’s influence in British politics has been a matter of some debate. While he attacked both Tory and Whig policies, both the Reform Bill of 1832 (promoted by Bentham’s disciple, Lord Henry Brougham) and later reforms in the century (such as the secret ballot, advocated by Bentham’s friend, George Grote, who was elected to parliament in 1832) reflected Benthamite concerns. The impact of Bentham’s ideas goes further still. Contemporary philosophical and economic vocabulary (for example, “international,” “maximize,” “minimize,” and “codification”) is indebted to Bentham’s proclivity for inventing terms, and among his other disciples were James Mill and his son, John (who was responsible for an early edition of some of Bentham’s manuscripts), as well as the legal theorist, John Austin.
At his death in London, on June 6, 1832, Bentham left literally tens of thousands of manuscript pages—some of which was work only sketched out, but all of which he hoped would be prepared for publication. He also left a large estate, which was used to finance the newly-established University College, London (for those individuals excluded from university education—that is, non-conformists, Catholics and Jews), and his cadaver, per his instructions, was dissected, embalmed, dressed, and placed in a chair, and to this day resides in a cabinet in a corridor of the main building of University College. The Bentham Project, set up in the early 1960s at University College, has as its aim the publishing of a definitive, scholarly edition of Bentham’s works and correspondence.
Influenced by the philosophes of the Enlightenment (such as Beccaria, Helvétius, Diderot, D’Alembert, and Voltaire) and also by Locke and Hume, Bentham’s work combined an empiricist approach with a rationalism that emphasized conceptual clarity and deductive argument. Locke’s influence was primarily as the author of the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, and Bentham saw in him a model of one who emphasized the importance of reason over custom and tradition and who insisted on precision in the use of terms. Hume’s influence was not so much on Bentham’s method as on his account of the underlying principles of psychological associationism and on his articulation of the principle of utility, which was then still often annexed to theological views.
Bentham’s analytical and empirical method is especially obvious when one looks at some of his main criticisms of the law and of moral and political discourse in general. His principal target was the presence of “fictions”—in particular, legal fictions. On his view, to consider any part or aspect of a thing in abstraction from that thing is to run the risk of confusion or to cause positive deceit. While, in some cases, such “fictional” terms as “relation,” “right,” “power,” and “possession” were of some use, in many cases their original warrant had been forgotten, so that they survived as the product of either prejudice or inattention. In those cases where the terms could be “cashed out” in terms of the properties of real things, they could continue to be used, but otherwise they were to be abandoned. Still, Bentham hoped to eliminate legal fictions as far as possible from the law, including the legal fiction that there was some original contract that explained why there was any law at all. He thought that, at the very least, clarifications and justifications could be given that avoided the use of such terms.
For Bentham, morals and legislation can be described scientifically, but such a description requires an account of human nature. Just as nature is explained through reference to the laws of physics, so human behavior can be explained by reference to the two primary motives of pleasure and pain; this is the theory of psychological hedonism.
There is, Bentham admits, no direct proof of such an analysis of human motivation—though he holds that it is clear that, in acting, all people implicitly refer to it. At the beginning of the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, Bentham writes:
Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne. They govern us in all we do, in all we say, in all we think: every effort we can make to throw off our subjection, will serve but to demonstrate and confirm it. (Ch. 1)
From this we see that, for Bentham, pleasure and pain serve not only as explanations for action, but they also define one’s good. It is, in short, on the basis of pleasures and pains, which can exist only in individuals, that Bentham thought one could construct a calculus of value.
Related to this fundamental hedonism is a view of the individual as exhibiting a natural, rational self-interest—a form of psychological egoism. In his “Remarks on Bentham’s Philosophy” (1833), Mill cites Bentham’s The Book of Fallacies (London: Hunt, 1824, pp. 392-3) that “[i]n every human breast… self-regarding interest is predominant over social interest; each person’s own individual interest over the interests of all other persons taken together.” Fundamental to the nature and activity of individuals, then, is their own well-being, and reason—as a natural capability of the person—is considered to be subservient to this end.
Bentham believed that the nature of the human person can be adequately described without mention of social relationships. To begin with, the idea of “relation” is but a “fictitious entity,” though necessary for “convenience of discourse.” And, more specifically, he remarks that “the community is a fictitious body,” and it is but “the sum of the interests of the several members who compose it.” Thus, the extension of the term “individual” is, in the main, no greater and no less than the biological entity. Bentham’s view, then, is that the individual—the basic unit of the social sphere—is an “atom” and there is no “self” or “individual” greater than the human individual. A person’s relations with others—even if important—are not essential and describe nothing that is, strictly speaking, necessary to its being what it is.
Finally, the picture of the human person presented by Bentham is based on a psychological associationism indebted to David Hartley and Hume; Bentham’s analysis of “habit” (which is essential to his understanding of society and especially political society) particularly reflects associationist presuppositions. On this view, pleasure and pain are objective states and can be measured in terms of their intensity, duration, certainty, proximity, fecundity and purity. This allows both for an objective determination of an activity or state and for a comparison with others.
Bentham’s understanding of human nature reveals, in short, a psychological, ontological, and also moral individualism where, to extend the critique of utilitarianism made by Graeme Duncan and John Gray (1979), “the individual human being is conceived as the source of values and as himself the supreme value.”
As Elie Halévy (1904) notes, there are three principal characteristics of which constitute the basis of Bentham’s moral and political philosophy: (i) the greatest happiness principle, (ii) universal egoism and (iii) the artificial identification of one’s interests with those of others. Though these characteristics are present throughout his work, they are particularly evident in the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, where Bentham is concerned with articulating rational principles that would provide a basis and guide for legal, social and moral reform.
To begin with, Bentham’s moral philosophy reflects what he calls at different times “the greatest happiness principle” or “the principle of utility”—a term which he borrows from Hume. In adverting to this principle, however, he was not referring to just the usefulness of things or actions, but to the extent to which these things or actions promote the general happiness. Specifically, then, what is morally obligatory is that which produces the greatest amount of happiness for the greatest number of people, happiness being determined by reference to the presence of pleasure and the absence of pain. Thus, Bentham writes, “By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question: or, what is the same thing in other words, to promote or to oppose that happiness.” And Bentham emphasizes that this applies to “every action whatsoever” (Ch. 1). That which does not maximize the greatest happiness (such as an act of pure ascetic sacrifice) is, therefore, morally wrong. (Unlike some of the previous attempts at articulating a universal hedonism, Bentham’s approach is thoroughly naturalistic.)
Bentham’s moral philosophy, then, clearly reflects his psychological view that the primary motivators in human beings are pleasure and pain. Bentham admits that his version of the principle of utility is something that does not admit of direct proof, but he notes that this is not a problem as some explanatory principles do not admit of any such proof and all explanation must start somewhere. But this, by itself, does not explain why another’s happiness—or the general happiness—should count. And, in fact, he provides a number of suggestions that could serve as answers to the question of why we should be concerned with the happiness of others.
First, Bentham says, the principle of utility is something to which individuals, in acting, refer either explicitly or implicitly, and this is something that can be ascertained and confirmed by simple observation. Indeed, Bentham held that all existing systems of morality can be “reduced to the principles of sympathy and antipathy,” which is precisely that which defines utility. A second argument found in Bentham is that, if pleasure is the good, then it is good irrespective of whose pleasure it is. Thus, a moral injunction to pursue or maximize pleasure has force independently of the specific interests of the person acting. Bentham also suggests that individuals would reasonably seek the general happiness simply because the interests of others are inextricably bound up with their own, though he recognized that this is something that is easy for individuals to ignore. Nevertheless, Bentham envisages a solution to this as well. Specifically, he proposes that making this identification of interests obvious and, when necessary, bringing diverse interests together would be the responsibility of the legislator.
Finally, Bentham held that there are advantages to a moral philosophy based on a principle of utility. To begin with, the principle of utility is clear (compared to other moral principles), allows for objective and disinterested public discussion, and enables decisions to be made where there seem to be conflicts of (prima facie) legitimate interests. Moreover, in calculating the pleasures and pains involved in carrying out a course of action (the “hedonic calculus”), there is a fundamental commitment to human equality. The principle of utility presupposes that “one man is worth just the same as another man” and so there is a guarantee that in calculating the greatest happiness “each person is to count for one and no one for more than one.”
For Bentham, then, there is no inconsistency between the greatest happiness principle and his psychological hedonism and egoism. Thus, he writes that moral philosophy or ethics can be simply described as “the art of directing men’s action to the production of the greatest possible quantity of happiness, on the part of those whose interest is in view.”
Bentham was regarded as the central figure of a group of intellectuals called, by Elie Halévy (1904), “the philosophic radicals,” of which both Mill and Herbert Spencer can be counted among the “spiritual descendants.” While it would be too strong to claim that the ideas of the philosophic radicals reflected a common political theory, it is nevertheless correct to say that they agreed that many of the social problems of late eighteenth and early nineteenth century England were due to an antiquated legal system and to the control of the economy by a hereditary landed gentry opposed to modern capitalist institutions. As discussed in the preceding section, for Bentham, the principles that govern morals also govern politics and law, and political reform requires a clear understanding of human nature. While he develops a number of principles already present in Anglo-Saxon political philosophy, he breaks with that tradition in significant ways.
In his earliest work, A Fragment on Government (1776), which is an excerpt from a longer work published only in 1928 as Comment on Blackstone’s Commentaries, Bentham attacked the legal theory of Sir William Blackstone. Bentham’s target was, primarily, Blackstone’s defense of tradition in law. Bentham advocated the rational revision of the legal system, a restructuring of the process of determining responsibility and of punishment, and a more extensive freedom of contract. This, he believed, would favor not only the development of the community, but the personal development of the individual.
Bentham’s attack on Blackstone targeted more than the latter’s use of tradition however. Against Blackstone and a number of earlier thinkers (including Locke), Bentham repudiated many of the concepts underlying their political philosophies, such as natural right, state of nature, and social contract. Bentham then attempted to outline positive alternatives to the preceding “traditionalisms.” Not only did he work to reform and restructure existing institutions, but he promoted broader suffrage and self (that is, representative) government.
The notion of liberty present in Bentham’s account is what is now generally referred to as “negative” liberty—freedom from external restraint or compulsion. Bentham says that “[l]iberty is the absence of restraint” and so, to the extent that one is not hindered by others, one has liberty and is “free.” Bentham denies that liberty is “natural” (in the sense of existing “prior to” social life and thereby imposing limits on the state) or that there is an a priori sphere of liberty in which the individual is sovereign. In fact, Bentham holds that people have always lived in society, and so there can be no state of nature (though he does distinguish between political society and “natural society”) and no “social contract” (a notion which he held was not only unhistorical but pernicious). Nevertheless, he does note that there is an important distinction between one’s public and private life that has morally significant consequences, and he holds that liberty is a good—that, even though it is not something that is a fundamental value, it reflects the greatest happiness principle.
Correlative with this account of liberty, Bentham (as Thomas Hobbes before him) viewed law as “negative.” Given that pleasure and pain are fundamental to—indeed, provide—the standard of value for Bentham, liberty is a good (because it is “pleasant”) and the restriction of liberty is an evil (because it is “painful”). Law, which is by its very nature a restriction of liberty and painful to those whose freedom is restricted, is a prima facie evil. It is only so far as control by the state is limited that the individual is free. Law is, Bentham recognized, necessary to social order and good laws are clearly essential to good government. Indeed, perhaps more than Locke, Bentham saw the positive role to be played by law and government, particularly in achieving community well-being. To the extent that law advances and protects one’s economic and personal goods and that what government exists is self-government, law reflects the interests of the individual.
Unlike many earlier thinkers, Bentham held that law is not rooted in a “natural law” but is simply a command expressing the will of the sovereign. (This account of law, later developed by Austin, is characteristic of legal positivism.) Thus, a law that commands morally questionable or morally evil actions, or that is not based on consent, is still law.
Bentham’s views on rights are, perhaps, best known through the attacks on the concept of “natural rights” that appear throughout his work. These criticisms are especially developed in his Anarchical Fallacies (a polemical attack on the declarations of rights issued in France during the French Revolution), written between 1791 and 1795 but not published until 1816, in French. Bentham’s criticisms here are rooted in his understanding of the nature of law. Rights are created by the law, and law is simply a command of the sovereign. The existence of law and rights, therefore, requires government. Rights are also usually (though not necessarily) correlative with duties determined by the law and, as in Hobbes, are either those which the law explicitly gives us or those within a legal system where the law is silent. The view that there could be rights not based on sovereign command and which pre-exist the establishment of government is rejected.
According to Bentham, then, the term “natural right” is a “perversion of language.” It is “ambiguous,” “sentimental” and “figurative” and it has anarchical consequences. At best, such a “right” may tell us what we ought to do; it cannot serve as a legal restriction on what we can or cannot do. The term “natural right” is ambiguous, Bentham says, because it suggests that there are general rights—that is, rights over no specific object—so that one would have a claim on whatever one chooses. The effect of exercising such a universal, natural “right” would be to extinguish the right altogether, since “what is every man’s right is no man’s right.” No legal system could function with such a broad conception of rights. Thus, there cannot be any general rights in the sense suggested by the French declarations.
Moreover, the notion of natural rights is figurative. Properly speaking, there are no rights anterior to government. The assumption of the existence of such rights, Bentham says, seems to be derived from the theory of the social contract. Here, individuals form a society and choose a government through the alienation of certain of their rights. But such a doctrine is not only unhistorical, according to Bentham, it does not even serve as a useful fiction to explain the origin of political authority. Governments arise by habit or by force, and for contracts (and, specifically, some original contract) to bind, there must already be a government in place to enforce them.
Finally, the idea of a natural right is “anarchical.” Such a right, Bentham claims, entails a freedom from all restraint and, in particular, from all legal restraint. Since a natural right would be anterior to law, it could not be limited by law, and (since human beings are motivated by self-interest) if everyone had such freedom, the result would be pure anarchy. To have a right in any meaningful sense entails that others cannot legitimately interfere with one’s rights, and this implies that rights must be capable of enforcement. Such restriction, as noted earlier, is the province of the law.
Bentham concludes, therefore, that the term “natural rights” is “simple nonsense: natural and imprescriptible rights, rhetorical nonsense,—nonsense upon stilts.” Rights—what Bentham calls “real” rights—are fundamentally legal rights. All rights must be legal and specific (that is, having both a specific object and subject). They ought to be made because of their conduciveness to “the general mass of felicity,” and correlatively, when their abolition would be to the advantage of society, rights ought to be abolished. So far as rights exist in law, they are protected; outside of law, they are at best “reasons for wishing there were such things as rights.” While Bentham’s essays against natural rights are largely polemical, many of his objections continue to be influential in contemporary political philosophy.
Nevertheless, Bentham did not dismiss talk of rights altogether. There are some services that are essential to the happiness of human beings and that cannot be left to others to fulfill as they see fit, and so these individuals must be compelled, on pain of punishment, to fulfill them. They must, in other words, respect the rights of others. Thus, although Bentham was generally suspicious of the concept of rights, he does allow that the term is useful, and in such work as A General View of a Complete Code of Laws, he enumerates a large number of rights. While the meaning he assigns to these rights is largely stipulative rather than descriptive, they clearly reflect principles defended throughout his work.
There has been some debate over the extent to which the rights that Bentham defends are based on or reducible to duties or obligations, whether he can consistently maintain that such duties or obligations are based on the principle of utility, and whether the existence of what Bentham calls “permissive rights”—rights one has where the law is silent—is consistent with his general utilitarian view. This latter point has been discussed at length by H.L.A. Hart (1973) and David Lyons (1969).
The standard edition of Bentham’s writings is The Works of Jeremy Bentham, (ed. John Bowring), London, 1838-1843; Reprinted New York, 1962. The contents are as follows:
A new edition of Bentham’s Works is being prepared by The Bentham Project at University College, University of London. This edition includes:
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Last updated: December 23, 2008 | Originally published: