Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

George Berkeley (1685—1753)

berkeley

George Berkeley was one of the three most famous British Empiricists. (The other two are John Locke and David Hume.)  Berkeley is best known for his early works on vision (An Essay towards a New Theory of Vision, 1709) and metaphysics (A Treatise concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, 1710; Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous, 1713).

Berkeley’s empirical theory of vision challenged the then-standard account of distance vision, an account which requires tacit geometrical calculations.  His alternative account focuses on visual and tactual objects.  Berkeley argues that the visual perception of distance is explained by the correlation of ideas of sight and touch.  This associative approach does away with appeals to geometrical calculation while explaining monocular vision and the moon illusion, anomalies that had plagued the geometric account.

Berkeley claimed that abstract ideas are the source of all philosophical perplexity and illusion.  In his Introduction to the Principles of Human Knowledge he argued that, as Locke described abstract ideas (Berkeley considered Locke’s the best account of abstraction), (1) they cannot, in fact, be formed, (2) they are not needed for communication or knowledge, and (3) they are inconsistent and therefore inconceivable.

In the Principles and the Three Dialogues Berkeley defends two metaphysical theses:  idealism (the claim that everything that exists either is a mind or depends on a mind for its existence) and immaterialism (the claim that matter does not exist).  His contention that all physical objects are composed of ideas is encapsulated in his motto esse is percipi (to be is to be perceived).

Although Berkeley’s early works were idealistic, he says little in them regarding the nature of one’s knowledge of the mind.  Much of what can be gleaned regarding Berkeley’s account of mind is derived from the remarks on “notions” that were added to the 1734 editions of the Principles and the Three Dialogues.

Berkeley was a priest of the Church of Ireland.  In the 1720s, his religious interests came to the fore.  He was named Dean of Derry in 1724.  He attempted to found a college in Bermuda, spending several years in Rhode Island waiting for the British government to provide the funding it had promised.  When it became clear that the funding would not be provided, he returned to London.  There he published Alciphron (a defense of Christianity), criticisms of Newton’s theory of infinitesimals, The Theory of Vision Vindicated, and revised editions of the Principles, and the Three Dialogues.  He was named Bishop of Cloyne in 1734 and lived in Cloyne until his retirement in 1752.  He was a good bishop, seeking the welfare of Protestants and Catholics alike.  His Querist (1735-1737) presents arguments for the reform of the Irish economy.  His last philosophical work, Siris (1744), includes a discussion of the medicinal virtues of tar water, followed by properly philosophical discussions that many scholars see as a departure from his earlier idealism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Essays on Vision
  3. Against Abstraction
  4. Idealism and Immaterialism
  5. Notions
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

George Berkeley was born in or near Kilkenny, Ireland on 12 March 1685. He was raised in Dysart Castle. Although his father was English, Berkeley always considered himself Irish. In 1696, he entered Kilkenny College. He entered Trinity College, Dublin on 21 March 1700 and received his B.A. in 1704. He remained associated with Trinity College until 1724. In 1706 he competed for a College Fellowship which had become available and became a Junior Fellow on 9 June 1707. After completing his doctorate, he became a Senior Fellow in 1717. As was common practice for British academics at the time, Berkeley was ordained as an Anglican priest in 1710.

The works for which Berkeley is best known were written during his Trinity College period. In 1709, he published An Essay towards a New Theory of Vision. In 1710, he published A Treatise concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, Part I. In 1712, he published Passive Obedience, which focuses on moral and political philosophy. In 1713, he published Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous. In 1721, he published De Motu. In addition, there is a set of notebooks, often called the Philosophical Commentaries (PC), that covers the period during which he developed his idealism and immaterialism. These were personal notebooks, and he never intended to publish them.

While Berkeley was associated with Trinity College until 1724, he was not continuously in residence. In 1713, he left for London, in part to arrange publication for the Three Dialogues. He befriended some of the intellectual lights of the time, including Jonathan Swift, Joseph Addison, Richard Steele, and Alexander Pope. He contributed several articles against free-thinking (agnosticism) to Steele’s Guardian. Since the articles were unsigned, disagreement remains regarding which articles Berkeley wrote. He was the chaplain to Lord Peterborough during his 1713-1714 continental tour. There is some evidence that Berkeley met the French philosopher Nicholas Malebranche during that tour, although the popular myth that their conversation occasioned Malebranche’s death is false: Malebranche died in 1715. He was the chaperone of young St. George Ashe, son of the Trinity College provost, during his continental tour from 1716-21. It was during this tour that Berkeley later claimed to have lost the manuscript to the second part of the Principles (Works 2:282). He observed the eruption of Mount Vesuvius in 1717 and sent a description of it to the Royal Society (Works 4:247-250). While in Lyon, France in 1720, Berkeley wrote De Motu, an essay on motion which reflects his scientific instrumentalism. The manuscript was Berkeley’s entry for a dissertation prize sponsored by the French Academy. It did not win.

In May 1724, Berkeley became Anglican Dean of Derry and resigned his position at Trinity College. He was never a dean in residence. Between 1722 and 1728, Berkeley developed a plan to establish a seminary in Bermuda for the sons of colonists and Native Americans. He actively lobbied for his project. He obtained a charter for the college, private contributions, and a promise for a grant of £20,000 from the British Parliament. After marrying Anne Foster on August 1, 1728, he and his bride departed for America in September 1728. He settled near Newport, Rhode Island, waiting for the promised grant. He bought a farm and built a house named Whitehall, which is still standing. He was an active cleric during his stay in Rhode Island. He was in contact with some of the leading American intellectuals of the time, including Samuel Johnson, who became the first president of King’s College (now Columbia University). He wrote the bulk of Alciphron, his defense of Christianity against free-thinking, while in America. In early 1731, Edmund Gibson, the Bishop of London, informed Berkeley that Sir Robert Walpole had informed him that there was little likelihood that the promised grant would be paid. Berkeley returned to London in October 1731. Before leaving America he divided his library between the Harvard and Yale libraries, and he gave his farm to Yale.

After his return to London, Berkeley published A Sermon before the Society for the Propagation of the Gospel in Foreign Parts (1732), Alciphron: or the Minute Philosopher (1732), The Theory of Vision, or Visual Language shewing the immediate Presence and Providence of A Deity, Vindicated and Explained (1733), The Analyst; or, a Discourse Addressed to an Infidel Mathematician (1734), A Defense of Free-Thinking in Mathematics (1735), Reasons for not Replying to Mr Walton’s Full Answer (1735), as well as revised editions of the Principles and the Dialogues (1734). The revisions of the Principles and Dialogues contain Berkeley’s scant remarks on the nature and one’s knowledge of mind (notions).

While the Bermuda Project was a practical failure, it increased Berkeley’s reputation as a religious leader. It is considered partially responsible for his appointment as Bishop of Cloyne in January 1734. In February 1734 he resigned as Dean of Derry. He was consecrated Bishop of Cloyne in St. Paul’s Church, Dublin, on 19 May 1734.

Berkeley was a good bishop. As bishop of an economically poor Anglican diocese in a predominantly Roman Catholic country, he was committed to the well-being of both Protestants and Catholics. He established a school to teach spinning, and he attempted to establish the manufacture of linen. His Querist (1735-1737) concerns economic and social issues germane to Ireland. Among other things, it contains a proposal for monetary reform. His Siris (1744) prefaces his philosophical discussions with an account of the medicinal value of tar water. The relationship of Siris to his early philosophy continues to be a matter of scholarly discussion.

Except for a trip to Dublin in 1737 to address the Irish House of Lords and a trip to Kilkenny in 1750 to visit family, he was continually in Cloyne until his retirement. In August 1752, Berkeley and his family left Cloyne for Oxford, ostensibly to oversee the education of his son George. While at Oxford, he arranged for the republication of his Alciphron and the publication of his Miscellany, a collection of essays on various subjects. He died on January 14, 1753 while his wife was reading him a sermon. In keeping with his will, his body was “kept five days above ground, … even till it grow offensive by the cadaverous smell” (Works 8:381), a provision that was intended to prevent premature burial. (This was the age in which some caskets were fitted with bells above ground so the “dead” could “ring up” if their beneficiaries had been a bit hasty.)

2. Essays on Vision

In 1709, Berkeley published An Essay towards a New Theory of Vision (NTV). This is an empirical account of the perception of distance, magnitude, and figure. The New Theory of Vision does not presuppose immaterialism, and, although Berkeley held that it was connected with his later works, the degree of connection is hotly contested among scholars. Berkeley also discusses vision in Dialogue 4 of Alciphron (1732), and, in reply to a set of objections, in the Theory of Vision …Vindicated (TVV). He alludes to his account of vision in the Principles of Human Knowledge (PHK §§42-44) and the Three Dialogues (DHP1 201-203).

Berkeley’s objective in the New Theory of Vision was “to shew the manner wherein we perceive by sight the distance, magnitude, and situation of objects. Also to consider the difference there is betwixt the ideas of sight and touch, and whether there be any idea common to both senses” (NTV §1). Berkeley agrees with other writers on optics that distance is not immediately seen (NTV §2) and recounts the positions of earlier writers. Some held that we correlate our current perceptions with earlier perceptions and judge that the objects are distant because we had experienced the large size of intermediate objects, or because the objects which now appear small and faint had earlier appeared large and vigorous (NTV §3). Some, such as Descartes, held that distance is judged by a natural geometry based on the angles between the perceived object and the eyes or on the angles of the rays of light that fall upon the eye (NTV §§4 and 6, and Works 1:237-238; Descartes 1:170). Berkeley rejects those accounts.

When one perceives mediately, one perceives one idea by means of perceiving another (NTV §9), for example, one perceives that someone is frightened by perceiving the paleness of her face (NTV §10). Empirically, the geometrical account fails, since one perceives neither the requisite lines, nor angles, nor rays as such (NTV §§12-15), even though such mathematical computations can be useful in determining the apparent distance or magnitude of an object (NTV §§ 38, 78; TVV §58). So, what are the immediate ideas that mediate the perception of distance? First, there are the kinesthetic sensations associated with focusing the eyes when perceiving objects at various distances (NTV §16). Second, as objects are brought closer to the eye, their appearance becomes more confused (blurred or double, NTV §21). Third, as an object approaches the eyes, the degree of confusion can be mitigated by straining the eyes, which is recognized by kinesthetic sensations (NTV §27). In each case, there is no necessary connection between the ideas and distance; there is merely a customary connection between two types of ideas (NTV §§17, 26, 28). A necessary connection is a relation such as that found among numbers in true arithmetic equations. It is impossible for 7+3 to equal anything other than 10, and it is impossible to imagine it to be anything other than 10. A customary connection is a relation found in experience in which one type of idea is found with or followed by another, but which one could imagine the situation to be otherwise. David Hume’s famous example is that experience shows that whenever one billiard ball hits another, the second rolls away, but the fact that one could imagine anything happening shows that there is merely a customary connection between the actions of the billiard balls. It is in this sense that ideas of touch and sight are merely customarily, and not necessarily, connected. The absence of a necessary connection between these ideas is further illustrated by the fact that nearsighted (purblind) persons find that objects appear less, rather than more, confused as they approach to the eyes (NTV §37). Since one perceives distance by sight mediately through the correlation of visual ideas with nonvisual ideas, a person born blind and who came to see would have no notion of visual distance: even the most remote objects would “seem to be in his eye, or rather his mind (NTV §41) This is Berkeley’s first allusion to Molyneux’s man-born-blind-made-to-see (cf. Locke 2.9.8, pp. 145-146), which Berkeley regularly uses to show the consequences of his theory of vision (see also NTV §§79, 110, and 132-133; TVV §71). Molyneux’s contention was that if a person were born blind and had learned to distinguish a cube from a sphere by touch, he would not immediately be able to distinguish a visual cube from a sphere if he were given sight.

Like most philosophers of the period, Berkeley seems to assume that touch provides immediate access to the world. Visual ideas of an object, on the other hand, vary with one’s distance from the object. As one approaches a tower one judges to be about a mile away, “the appearance alters, and from being obscure, small, and faint, grows clear, large, and vigorous” (NTV §44). The tower is taken to be of a determinate size and shape, but the visual appearance continually changes. How can that be? Berkeley claims that visual ideas are merely signs of tactile ideas. There is no resemblance between visual and tactile ideas. Their relationship is like that between words and their meanings. If one hears a noun, one thinks of an object it denotes. Similarly, if one sees an object, one thinks of a corresponding idea of touch, which Berkeley deems the secondary (mediate) object of sight. In both cases, there are no necessary connections between the ideas. The associative connection is based on experience (NTV §51; cf. TVV §40, Alciphron, Dialogue 4).

His discussion of magnitude is analogous to his discussion of distance. Berkeley explores the relationships between the objects of sight and touch by introducing the notions of minimum visibles and tangibles, the smallest points one actually can perceive by sight and touch, points which must be taken to be indivisible. The apparent size of a visible object varies with distance, while the size of the corresponding tangible object is taken to be constant (NTV §55). The apparent size of the visual object, its confusion or distinctness, and its faintness or vigor play roles in judging the size of the tangible object. All things being equal, if it appears large, it is taken to be large. “But, be the idea immediately perceived by sight never so large, yet if it be withal confused, I judge the magnitude of the thing to be but small. If it be distinct and clear, I judge it greater. And if it be faint, I apprehend it to be yet greater” (NTV §56; see also §57). As in the case of distance, there are no necessary connections between the sensory elements of the visual and tangible object. The correlations are only known by consistent experience (NTV §§59, 62-64), and Berkeley argues that measurements (inches, feet, etc.) are applicable only to tangible size (NTV §61).

The arguments are repeated, mutates mutandis, regarding visual and tangible figure (NTV §§105ff).

Berkeley argues that the objects of sight and touch – indeed, the objects of each sensible modalities – are distinct and incommensurable. This is known as the heterogeneity thesis (see NTV §§108ff). The tower that visually appears to be small and round from a distance is perceived to be large and square by touch. So, one complex tactual object corresponds to the indefinitely large number of visual objects. Since there are no necessary connections between the objects of sight and touch, the objects must be distinct. Further, his discussion of “hearing the coach approach” shows that there is a similar distinction between the objects of hearing and touch (NTV §46). Given the hypothesis that the number of minimum visibles seen is constant and the same among individual humans and other creatures (NTV §§80-81), it follows that the objects seen when using a microscope are not the same as those seen by the naked eye (NTV §85; cf. NTV §105 and DHP3 245-246).

Before turning to the discussions of Berkeley’s idealism and immaterialism, there are several points we should notice. First, there are various points in the New Theory of Vision where Berkeley writes as if ideas of touch are or are of external objects (cf. §§ 46, 64, 77, 78, 82, 88, 99, 117, 155). Since the Berkeley of the Principles and Dialogues contends that all ideas are mind-dependent and all physical objects are composed of ideas, some have questioned whether the position in the New Theory of Vision is consistent with the work that immediately follows. Some scholars suggest that either that the works on vision are scientific works which, as such, make no metaphysical commitments or that allusions to “external objects” are cases of speaking with the vulgar. Secondly, insofar as in his later works Berkeley claims that ordinary objects are composed of ideas, his discussion of the correlation of ideas of sight and touch tends to anticipate his later view by explaining how one “collects” the ideas of distinct senses to form one thing. Finally, the New Theory of Vision includes discussions of the primary/secondary qualities distinction (§§43, 48-49, 61, 109) and of abstraction (NTV §§122-127) that anticipate his later discussions of those topics.

3. Against Abstraction

In the Introduction to the Principles of Human Knowledge, Berkeley laments the doubt and uncertainty found in philosophical discussions (Intro. §§1-3), and he attempts to find those principles that drew philosophy away from common sense and intuition (PHK §4). He finds the source of skepticism in the theory of abstract ideas, which he criticizes.

Berkeley begins by giving a general overview of the doctrine:

It is agreed on all hands, that the qualities or modes of things do never really exist each of them apart by it self, and separated from all others, but are mixed, as it were, and blended together, several in the same object. But we are told, the mind being able to consider each quality singly, or abstracted from those other qualities with which it is united, does by that means frame to it self abstract ideas. … Not that it is possible for colour or motion to exist without extension: but only that the mind can frame to it self by abstraction the idea of colour exclusive of extension, and of motion exclusive of both colour and extension. (Intro, §7)

In §§8-9 he details the doctrine in terms of Locke’s account in the Essay concerning Human Understanding. Although theories of abstraction date back at least to Aristotle (Metaphysics, Book K, Chapter 3, 1061a29-1069b4), were prevalent among the medievals (cf. Intro, §17 and PC §779), and are found in the Cartesians (Descartes, 1:212-213; Arnauld and Nicole, pp. 37-38), there seem to be two reasons why Berkeley focused on Locke. First, Locke’s work was recent and familiar. Second, Berkeley seems to have considered Locke’s account the best available. As he wrote in his notebooks, “Wonderful in Locke that he could wn advanc’d in years see at all thro a mist yt had been so long a gathering & was consequently thick. This more to be admir’d than yt he didn’t see farther” (PC §567).

According to Locke, the doctrine of abstract ideas explains how knowledge can be communicated and how it can be increased. It explains how general terms obtain meaning (Locke, 3.3.1-20, pp. 409-420). A general term, such as ‘cat’ refers to an abstract general idea, which contains all and only those properties that one deems common to all cats, or, more properly, the ways in which all cats resemble each other. The connection between a general term and an abstract idea is arbitrary and conventional, and the relation between an abstract idea and the individual objects falling under it is a natural relation (resemblance). If Locke’s theory is sound, it provides a means by which one can account for the meaning of general terms without invoking general objects (universals).

Berkeley’s attack on the doctrine of abstract ideas follows three tracks. (1) There is the “I can’t do it” argument in Intro. §10. (2) There is the “We don’t need it” argument in Intro. §§11-12. And (3) there is the “The theory leads to inconsistencies” argument in Intro. §13, which Berkeley deemed the “killing blow” (PC §687). As we shall see, Berkeley uses a similar tripartite attack on doctrine of material substance (see PHK §§16-23).

Having outlined Locke’s account of abstraction in Introduction §§8-9, which allegedly results in the idea of a human which is colored but has no determinate color – that the idea includes a general idea of color, but not a specific color such as black or white or brown or yellow – which has a size but has no determinate size, and so forth, Berkeley argues in §10 that he can form no such idea. On the face of it, his argument is weak. At most it shows that insofar as he cannot form the idea, and assuming that all humans have similar psychological abilities, there is some evidence that no humans can form abstract ideas of the sort Locke described.

But there is a remark made in passing that suggests there is a much stronger argument implicit in the section. Berkeley writes:

To be plain, I own my self able to abstract in one sense, as when I consider some particular parts or qualities separated from others, with which though they are united in some object, yet, it is possible they may really exist without them. But I deny that I can abstract one from another, or conceive separately, those qualities which it is impossible should exist so separated; or that I can frame a general notion by abstracting from particulars in the manner aforesaid. Which two last are the proper acceptations of abstraction. (Intro. §10)

This three-fold distinction among types of abstraction is found in Arnauld and Nicole’s Logic or the Art of Thinking. The first type of abstraction concerns integral parts. The head, arms, torso, and legs are integral parts of a body: each can exist in separation from the body of which it is a part (Arnauld and Nicole, p. 37). The second kind of abstraction “arises when we consider a mode without paying attention to its substance, or two modes which are joined together in the same substance, taking each one separately” (Arnauld and Nicole, p. 37). The third concerns distinctions of reason, for example, conceiving of a triangle as equilateral without conceiving of it as equiangular (Arnauld and Nicole, p. 38). Berkeley grants that he can abstract in the first sense – “I can consider the hand, the eye, the nose, each by it self abstracted or separated from the rest of the body” (Intro. §10) – but he denies that he can abstract in the latter two senses. The latter two cases represent impossible states of affairs. In §7 Berkeley noted that the abstractionists held that it is impossible for a mode to exist apart from a substance. Many abstractionists also accepted a conceivability criterion of possibility: If one can (clearly and distinctly) conceive of a state of affairs, then it is possible for that state of affairs to exist as conceived (cf. Descartes, 2:54). This principle entails that impossible states of affairs are inconceivable. So, granting it is impossible for a mode to exist apart from a substance (Intro. §7), it follows that it is impossible to conceive of a mode apart from a substance, that the second form abstraction is impossible. And if the second falls, the third falls as well, since the third requires that alternative descriptions of an object pick out no differences in reality. So, a traditional theory of modes and substances, the conceivability criterion of possibility, and abstraction are an inconsistent triad. The inconsistency can be resolved by dropping the doctrine of abstract ideas. Berkeley made this point explicitly in the first draft of the Introduction:

It is, I think, a receiv’d axiom that an impossibility cannot be conceiv’d. For what created intelligence will pretend to conceive, that which God cannot cause to be? Now it is on all hands agreed, that nothing abstract or general can be made really to exist, whence it should seem to follow, that it cannot have so much as an ideal existence in the understanding. (Works 2:125)

One of the marks of the modern period is an adherence to the principle of parsimony (Ockham’s Razor). The principle holds that the theoretically simpler of two explanations is more probably true. In the seventeenth and eighteen centuries, this was sometimes expressed as “God does nothing in vain” (cf. DHP2 214). So, if it is possible to construct a theory of meaning that does not introduce abstract ideas as a distinct kind of idea, that theory would be simpler and deemed more probably true. This is the strategy Berkeley adopts in Introduction §§11-12.

Granting Locke that all existents are particulars (Locke 3.3.6, p. 410), Berkeley remarks, “But it seems that a word becomes general by being made the sign, not of an abstract general idea but, of several particular ideas, any one of which it indifferently suggests to the mind” (Intro. §11). Ideas remain particular, although a particular idea can function as a general idea. For example, when a geometer draws a line on a blackboard, it is taken to represent all lines, even though the line itself is particular and has determinate qualities. Similarly, a particular idea can represent all similar ideas. So, whether one takes Berkeley to mean that words apply immediately to objects or that meaning is mediated by paradigmatic ideas, the theory is simpler than the abstractionists’ insofar as all ideas are particular and determinate.

In Introduction §13, Berkeley turns to Locke’s abstract general idea of a triangle, an idea which “must be neither oblique nor rectangle, neither equilateral, equicrural, nor scalenon, but all and none of these at once. In effect, it is something imperfect that cannot exist, an idea wherein some parts of several different and inconsistent ideas are put together” (Locke 4.7.9, p. 596; quoted in Intro. §13, Berkeley’s emphasis). Upon quoting the passage, Berkeley merely asks his reader whether he or she can form the idea, but his point seems to be much stronger. The described idea is inconsistent, and therefore represents an impossible state of affairs, and it is therefore inconceivable, since whatever is impossible is inconceivable. This is explicit in a parallel passage in the New Theory of Vision. After quoting the triangle passage, Berkeley remarks, “But had he called to mind what he says in another place, to wit, ‘That ideas of mixed modes wherein any inconsistent ideas are put together cannot so much as exist in the mind, i.e. be conceived.’ vid. B. iii. C. 10. S. 33. ibid. I say, had this occurred to his thoughts, it is not improbable he would have owned it above all the pains and skill he was master of, to form the above-mentioned idea of a triangle, which is made up of manifest, staring contradictions” (NTV §125).

If abstract ideas are not needed for communication – Berkeley takes the fact that infants and poorly educated people communicate, while the formation of abstract ideas is said to be difficult, as a basis for doubting the difficulty thesis (Intro. §14) – he is able to give short shrift to the contention that abstract ideas are necessary for knowledge. The abstractionists maintain that abstract ideas are needed for geometrical proofs. Berkeley argues that only properties concerning, for example, a triangle as such are germane to a geometric proof. So, even if one’s idea of a triangle is wholly determinate (consider a diagram on a blackboard), none of the differentiating properties prevent one from constructing a proof, since a proof is not concerned solely with the idea (or drawing) with which one begins. He maintains that it is consistent with his theory of meaning to selectively attend to a single aspect of a complex, determinate idea (Intro. §16).

Berkeley concludes his discussion of abstraction by noting that not all general words are used to denote objects or kinds of objects. His discussion of the nondenotative uses of language is often taken to anticipate Ludwig Wittgenstein’s interest in meaning-as-use.

4. Idealism and Immaterialism

Berkeley’s famous principle is esse is percipi, to be is to be perceived. Berkeley was an idealist. He held that ordinary objects are only collections of ideas, which are mind-dependent. Berkeley was an immaterialist. He held that there are no material substances. There are only finite mental substances and an infinite mental substance, namely, God. On these points there is general agreement. There is less agreement on Berkeley’s argumentative approach to idealism and immaterialism and on the role of some of his specific arguments. His central arguments are often deemed weak.

The account developed here is based primarily on the opening thirty-three sections of the Principles of Human Knowledge. It assumes, contrary to some commentators, that Berkeley’s metaphysics rests on epistemological foundations. This approach is prima facie plausible insofar as it explains the appeal to knowledge in the title of the Principles (cf. Intro. §4), it is consistent with Berkeley’s epistemic concerns in other writings (cf. TVV §18), and it provides an explanatory role for abstract ideas. There will be occasional digressions concerning the problems perceived by those who claim that Berkeley’s approach was more straightforwardly metaphysical.

Berkeley begins his discussion as follows:

It is evident to any one who takes a survey of the objects of human knowledge, that they are either ideas actually imprinted on the senses, or else such as are perceived by attending to the passions and operations of the mind, or lastly ideas formed by help of memory and imagination, either compounding, dividing, or barely representing those originally perceived in the aforesaid ways. (PHK §1).

This seems to say that ideas are the immediate objects of knowledge in a fundamental sense (acquaintance). Following Locke, there are ideas of sense, reflection, and imagination. So, ordinary objects, as known, are collections of ideas marked by a single name. Berkeley’s example is an apple.

If ideas are construed as objects of knowledge, then there must also be something that “knows or perceives them, and exercises divers operations, as willing, imagining, remembering about them” (PHK §2; cf. §6). This Berkeley calls this ‘mind’ or ‘spirit’. Minds (as knowers) are distinct from ideas (as things known). For an idea, to be is to be perceived (known). Since this holds for ideas in general, it holds for “sensations or ideas imprinted on the sense” in particular (§3).

Berkeley contends that the “opinion strangely prevailing amongst men, that houses, mountains, rivers, and in a world all sensible objects have an existence natural or real, distinct from being perceived” is inconsistent, “a manifest contradiction” (PHK §4). If one construes ‘sensible objects’ as ideas of sense, and ideas are objects of knowledge, then having a real existence distinct from being perceived would require that an object be known (as an idea) and unknown (as a thing distinct from being perceived), which is inconsistent. He explains the source of the error on the basis of the doctrine of abstract ideas (PHK §5), a discussion which parallels the discussion in Introduction §10.

Ordinary objects, as known, are nothing but collections of ideas. If, like Descartes, Berkeley holds that claims of existence are justified if and only if the existent can be known, then ordinary objects must be at least collections of ideas. As Berkeley put it, “all the choir of heaven and furniture of the earth, in a word all those bodies which compose the mighty frame of the world, have not any subsistence without a mind, that their being is to be perceived or known” (PHK §6). The only substance that can be known is a spirit or thinking substance (PHK §7). But notice what has not yet been shown. It has not been shown that ordinary objects are only collections of ideas, nor has it be shown that thinking substances are immaterial. Berkeley’s next move is to ask whether there are grounds for claiming ordinary objects are something more than ideas.

The above account is not the only interpretation of the first seven sections of the Principles. Many commentators take a more directly metaphysical approach. They assume that ideas are mental images (Pitcher, p.70; cf. Winkler, p. 13 and Muehlmann, p. 49), or objects of thought (Winker, p.6), or modes of a mental substance (Bracken, pp. 76ff), or immediate objects of perception (Pappas, pp. 21-22), or any of Berkeley’s other occasional characterizations of ideas, and proceed to show that, on the chosen account of ideas, Berkeley’s arguments fail. A. A. Luce tells us that Berkeley’s characterization of an apple in terms of ideas (PHK §1) is concerned with the apple itself, rather than a known apple (Luce 1963, p. 30; cf. Tipton, p. 70), which suggests that Berkeley begs the question of the analysis of body. Many commentators tell us that what seems to be an allusion to ideas of reflection in the first sentence of §1 cannot be such, since Berkeley claims one has no ideas of minds or mental states (PHK §§27, 89, 140, 142; DHP2 223, DHP3 231-233; cf. Works 2:42n1). They ignore his allusions to ideas of reflection (PHK §§13, 25, 35, 68, 74, 89) and the presumption that if there are such ideas, they are the effects of an active mind (cf. PHK §27). Many commentators suggest that the argument for esse is percipi is in §3 – ignoring the concluding words in §2 – and find the “manifest contradiction” in §4 puzzling at best. Most commentators assume that the case for idealism – the position that there are only minds and mind-dependent entities – is complete by §7 and lament that Berkeley has not established the ‘only’. The epistemic interpretation we have been developing seems to avoid these problems.

Berkeley holds that ordinary objects are at least collections of ideas. Are they something more? In §§8-24 Berkeley examines the prime contenders for this “something more,” namely, theories of material substance. He prefaces his discussion with his likeness principle, the principle that nothing but an idea can resemble an idea. “If we look but ever so little into our thoughts, we shall find it impossible for us to conceive a likeness except only between our ideas” (PHK §8). Why is this? A claim that two objects resemble each other can be justified only by a comparison of the objects (cf. PC §377, ##16-18). So, if only ideas are immediately perceived, only ideas can be compared. So, there can be no justification for a claim that an idea resembles anything but an idea. If claims of existence rest on epistemically justified principles, the likeness principle blocks both grounds for claiming that there are mediately perceived material objects and Locke’s claim that the primary qualities of objects resemble one’s ideas of them (Locke, 1.8.15, p. 137).

One of the marks of the modern period is the doctrine of primary and secondary qualities. Although it was anticipated by Descartes, Malebranche, and others, the terms themselves were introduced in Robert Boyle’s “Of the Origins of Forms and Qualities” (1666) and Locke’s Essay. Primary qualities are the properties of objects as such. The primary qualities are solidity, extension, figure, number, and mobility (Locke 2.8.9, p. 135; cf. 2.8.10, p. 135). Secondary qualities are either the those arrangements of corpuscles containing only primary qualities that cause one to have ideas of color, sound, taste, heat, cold, and smell (Locke 2.8.8, p. 135; 2.8.10, p. 135) or, on some accounts, the ideas themselves. If the distinction can be maintained, there would be grounds for claiming that ordinary objects are something more than ideas. It is this theory of matter Berkeley considers first.

After giving a sketch of Locke’s account of the primary/secondary quality distinction (PHK §9), his initial salvo focuses on his previous conclusions and the likeness principle. “By matter therefore we are to understand an inert, senseless substance, in which extension, figure, and motion, do actually subsist” (PHK §9). Such a view is inconsistent with his earlier conclusions that extension, figure, and motion are ideas. The likeness principle blocks any attempt to go beyond ideas on the basis of resemblance. Combining the previous conclusions with the standard account of primary qualities requires that primary qualities both exist apart from the mind and only in the mind. So, Berkeley concludes that “what is called matter or corporeal substance, involves a contradiction in it” (PHK §9). He then turns to the individual qualities.

If there is a distinction between primary and secondary qualities, there must be a ground for the distinction. Indeed, given the common contention that an efficient cause must be numerically distinct from its effect (see Arnauld and Nicole, p. 186; Arnauld in Descartes, 2:147; Locke 2.26.1-2, pp. 324-325), if one cannot show that primary and secondary qualities are distinct, there are grounds for questioning the causal hypothesis. Berkeley argues that there is no ground for the distinction. Appealing to what one knows – ideas as they are conceived – Berkeley argues that one cannot conceive of a primary quality such as extension without some secondary quality as well: one cannot “frame an idea of a body extended and moved, but I must withal give it some colour or other sensible quality which is acknowledged to exist only in the mind” (PHK §10). If such sensible qualities as color exist only in the mind, and extension and motion cannot be known without some sensible quality, there is no ground for claiming extension exists apart from the mind. The primary/secondary quality distinction collapses. The source of the philosophical error is cited as the doctrine of abstract ideas. His arguments in Principles §§11-15 show that no evidence can be found that any of the other so-called primary qualities can exist apart from the mind.

After disposing of the primary/secondary quality distinction, Berkeley turns to an older theory of material substance, a substratum theory. At least since Aristotle, philosophers had held that qualities of material objects depend on and exist in a substance which has those qualities. This supposed substance allegedly remains the same through change. But if one claims there are material substances, one must have reasons to support that claim. In Principles §§16-24 Berkeley develops a series of arguments to the effect that (1) one cannot form an idea of a substratum, (2) the theory of material substance plays no explanatory role, and (3) it is impossible to produce evidence for the mere possibility of such an entity.

Can one form an idea a substratum? No. At least one cannot form a positive idea of a material substratum itself – something like an image of the thing itself – a point that was granted by its most fervent supporters (see Descartes 1:210; Locke 2.23.3, p. 295). The most one can do is form “An obscure and relative Idea of Substance in general” (Locke 2.23.3, p. 296), “though you know not what it is, yet you must be supposed to know what relation it bears to accidents, and what is meant by its supporting them” (PHK §16). Berkeley argues that one cannot make good on the notion of ‘support’ – “It is evident support cannot here be taken in its usual or literal sense, as when we say that pillars support a building: in what sense therefore must it be taken?” (PHK §16) – so one does not even have a relative idea of material substratum. Without a clear notion of the alleged relation, one cannot single out a material substance on the basis of a relation to something perceived (PHK §17).

If an idea of a material substratum cannot be derived from sense experience, claims of its existence might be justified if it is necessary to provide an explanation of a phenomenon. But no such explanation is forthcoming. As Berkeley notes: “But what reason can induce us to believe the existence of bodies without the mind, from what we perceive, since the very patrons of matter themselves do not pretend, there is any necessary connexion betwixt them and our ideas? I say it is granted on all hands (and what happens in dreams, phrensies, and the like, puts it beyond dispute) that it is possible we might be affected with all the ideas we have now, though no bodies existed without, resembling them” (PHK 18). Since material substance is not necessary to provide an explanation of mental phenomena, reason cannot provide grounds for claiming the existence of a material substance.

Berkeley’s final move against material substance is sometimes called the “Master Argument.” It takes the form of a challenge, one on which Berkeley is willing to rest his entire case. “It is but looking into your own thoughts, and so trying whether you can conceive it possible for a sound, or figure, or motion, or colour, to exist without the mind, or unperceived. This easy trial may make you see, that what you contend for, is a downright contradiction” (PHK §22). Berkeley seems to argue that in any case one might consider – books in the back of a closet, plants deep in a wood with no one about, footprints on the far side of the moon – the objects are related to the mind conceiving of them. So, it is contradictory to claim that those objects have no relation to a mind (PHK, §§22-23; cf. DHP1 199-201). This is generally not considered Berkeley at his best, since many commentators argue that it is possible to distinguish between the object conceived and the conceiving of it. George Pappas has provided a more sympathetic interpretation of the passage. He contends that Berkeley is calling for an “impossible performance” (Pappas, pp. 141-144). Conceivability is the ground for claiming that an object is possible. If one conceives of an object, then that object is related to some mind, namely, the mind that conceives it. So, the problem is that it is not possible to fulfill the conditions necessary to show that it would be possible for an object to exist apart from a relation to a mind.

Thus, Berkeley concludes, there are no grounds for claiming that an ordinary object is more than a collection of ideas. The arguments in §§1-7 showed that ordinary objects are at least collections of ideas of sense. The arguments in §§8-24 provide grounds for claiming that ordinary objects are nothing more than ideas. So, Berkeley is justified in claiming that they are only ideas of sense. Berkeley’s argument for immaterialism is complete, although he has not yet provided criteria for distinguishing ideas of sense from ideas of memory and imagination. This is his task in §§29-33. Before turning to this, Berkeley introduces several remarks on mind.

Berkeley claims that an inspection of our ideas shows that they are causally inert (PHK §25). Since there is a continual succession of ideas in our minds, there must be some cause of it. Since this cause can be neither an idea nor a material substance, it must be a spiritual substance (PHK §26). This sets the stage for Berkeley’s argument for the existence of God and the distinction between real things and imaginary things.

One knows that one causes some of one’s own ideas (PHK §28). Since the mind is passive in perception, there are ideas which one’s own mind does not cause. Only a mind or spirit can be a cause. “There is therefore some other will or spirit that produces them” (PHK §29). As such, this is not an argument for the existence of God (see PHK §§146-149), although Berkeley’s further discussion assumes that at least one mind is the divine mind.

He is now in a position to distinguish ideas of sense from ideas of the imagination: “The ideas of sense are more strong, lively, and distinct than those of the imagination; they have likewise a steadiness, order, and coherence, and are not excited at random, as those which are the effects of human wills often are” (PHK §30). This provides the basis for both the distinction between ideas of sense and ideas of imagination and for the distinction between real things and imaginary things (PHK §33). Real things are composed solely of ideas of sense. Ideas of sense occur with predictable regularity; they form coherent wholes that themselves can be expected to “behave” in predictable ways. Ideas of sense follow (divinely established) laws of nature (PHK §§30. 34, 36, 62, 104).

So, Berkeley has given an account of ordinary objects without matter. Ordinary objects are nothing but lawfully arranged collections of ideas of sense.

5. Notions

If one reads the Principles and Dialogues, one discovers that Berkeley has little to say regarding our knowledge of minds, and most of what is found was added in the 1734 editions of those works. The reason is Berkeley originally intended the Principles to consist of at least three parts (cf. PC §583). The second was to examine issues germane to mind, God, morality, and freedom (PC §§508, 807). He told Samuel Johnson, his American correspondent, that the manuscript for the second part was lost during his travels in Italy in about 1716 (Works 2:282). In the 1734 editions of the Principles and Dialogues, Berkeley included brief discussions of our notions of minds.

Berkeley claims we do not have ideas of minds, since minds are active and ideas are passive (PHK §27; cf. §89, 140, 142). Nonetheless, “we have some notion of soul, spirit, and the operations of the mind, such as willing, loving, hating, in as much as we know or understand the meaning of those words” (PHK §27, 1734 edition). Given Berkeley’s theory of meaning, this seems to imply that so long as one able to pick out (distinguish) minds from other things one can have a notion of mind. Since Berkeley remarks, “Such is the nature of spirit or that which acts, that it cannot be of it self perceived, but only by the effects which it produceth” (PHK §27, all editions), one might come to believe that Berkeley knows minds in much the same way as Locke knows them. Locke claims one has a relative idea of substance in general (Locke 2.23.3, p. 296): one is able to pick out a substance as such on the basis of its relation to a directly perceived idea or quality. While nominally distinct from Lockean relative ideas, Berkeley could claim that notions pick out an individual mind as the thing that perceives some determinate idea (one’s own mind) or which causes some determinate idea (God or, perhaps, some other spirit). Since Berkeley held that causal and perceptual relations are necessary connections, this seems to avoid the problems with ‘support’ discussed in Principles §16. Such a position seems to be consistent with everything said in the Principles and much of what is said in the Dialogues (DHP2 2:223; DHP3 2:232-233). However, there are two passages in the Third Dialogue which suggest that one’s own mind is known directly, rather than relatively. Philonous says:

I own I have properly no idea, either of God or any other spirit; for these being active, cannot be represented by things perfectly inert, as our ideas are. I do nevertheless know, that I who am a spirit or thinking substance, exist as certainly, as I know my ideas exist. Farther, I know what I mean by the terms I and myself; and I know this immediately, or intuitively, though I do not perceive it as I perceive a triangle, a colour, or a sound. (DHP3 2:231, all editions)

How often must I repeat, that I know or am conscious of [my emphasis] my own being; and that I my self am not my ideas, but somewhat else, a thinking active principle that perceives, knows, wills, and operates about ideas. (DHP3 233, 1734 edition)

If you know yourself immediately “by a reflex act” (DHP3 232, all editions), and if this is independent of any relation to an idea, then it would seem that notions of oneself are nothing more than that unique way in which the mind knows itself. Nothing more can be said of them. Such a position seems to make notions an ad hoc addition to Berkeley’s philosophy.

But, perhaps, we need to draw a distinction between knowing that there is a mind and knowing what a mind is. Perhaps one might know directly that one has a mind, but one can know what a mind is only relative to ideas: a mind is that which causes or perceives ideas. One should not be surprised if this is Berkeley’s position. Such a relative understanding of the mind as knower and ideas as the known is already found in the opening sections of the Principles.

6. Concluding Remarks

According to Berkeley, the world consists of nothing but minds and ideas. Ordinary objects are collections of ideas. Already in his discussion of vision, he argued that one learns to coordinate ideas of sight and touch to judge distance, magnitude, and figure, properties which are immediately perceived only by touch. The ideas of one sense become signs of ideas of the other senses. In his philosophical writings, this coordination of regularly occurring ideas becomes the way the world is known and the way humans construct real things. If there are only minds and ideas, there is no place for some scientific constructs. Newtonian absolute space and time disappear. Time becomes nothing but the succession of ideas in individual minds (PHK §98). Motion is entirely object-relative (PHK §§112-117). Science becomes nothing more than a system of natural signs. With the banishing of abstraction, mathematics is reduced to a system of signs in which words or numerals signify other words or numerals (PHK §122). Space is reduced to sensible extension, and since one cannot actually divide a piece of extension into an infinite number of sensible parts, various geometrical paradoxes dissolve. As Berkeley understands them, science and Christian theology become compatible.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Berkeley, George. Philosophical Works, Including the Works on Vision. Edited by Michael R. Ayers. Everyman edition. London: J. M. Dent, 1975.
    • This is the most comprehensive one-volume edition of Berkeley’s philosophical works available. When the work is not divided into sections, marginal references are made to the page in The Works of George Berkeley.
  • Berkeley, George. The Works of George Berkeley, Bishop of Cloyne. Edited by A. A. Luce and T. E. Jessop. 9 volumes. London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1948-1957.
    • This is the standard edition of Berkeley’s works. Page references above are to this edition.
  • Arnauld, Antoine and Nicole, Pierre. Logic or the Art of Thinking. Translated by Jill Vance Buroker. Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • This was one of the most widely-read logic textbooks of the early modern period.
  • Atherton, Margaret. Berkeley’s Revolution in Vision. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990.
  • Belfrage, Bertil. “Towards a New Interpretation of Berkeley’s Theory of Vision” (in French). In Dominique Berlioz, editor, Berkeley: language de la perception et art de voir. Paris: Presses Universitires de France, 2003.
  • Berman, David. George Berkeley: Idealism and the Man. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994.
  • Boyle, Robert. Selected Philosophical Papers of Robert Boyle. Edited by M. S. Stewart. Philosophical Classics. Manchester: University of Manchester Press, 1979.
  • Bracken, Harry M. Berkeley. Philosophers in Perspective. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1974.
  • Dancy, Jonathan. Berkeley: An Introduction. Oxford: Blackwell, 1987.
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. Translated and edited by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Steward, and (volume 3) Anthony Kenny. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985, 1984, 1991.
  • Flage, Daniel E. Berkeley’s Doctrine of Notions: A Reconstruction based on his Theory of Meaning. London and New York: Croom Helm and St. Martin’s Press, 1987.
  • Grayling, A. C. Berkeley: The Central Arguments. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1986.
  • Locke, John. An Essay concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Luce, A. A. Berkeley’s Immaterialism: A Commentary on his “A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge”. London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1945.
  • Luce, A. A. The Dialectic of Immaterialism. London: Hodder and Stroughton, 1963.
  • Muehlmann, Robert G. Berkeley’s Ontology. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1992.
  • Pappas, George S. Berkeley’s Thought. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2000.
  • Pitcher, George. Berkeley. The Arguments of the Philosophers. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1977.
  • Stoneham, Tom. Berkeley’s World: An Examination of the Three Dialogues. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
  • Tipton, I. C. Berkeley: The Philosophy of Immaterialism. London: Methuen, 1974.
  • Warnock, G. J. Berkeley. London: Penquin, 1953.
  • Winkler, Kenneth P. Berkeley: An Interpretation. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989.

Author Information

Daniel E. Flage
Email: flagede@jmu.edu
James Madison University
U. S. A.




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