Bhartrihari may be considered one of the most original philosophers of language and religion in ancient India. He is known primarily as a grammarian, but his works have great philosophical significance, especially with regard to the connections they posit between grammar, logic, semantics, and ontology. His thought may be characterized as part of the shabdadvaita (word monistic) school of thought, which asserts that cognition and language at an ultimate level are ontologically identical concepts that refer to one supreme reality, Brahman. Bhartrihari interprets the notion of the originary word (shabda) as transcending the bounds of spoken and written language and meaning. Understood as shabda tattva-the “word principle,” this complex idea explains the nature of consciousness, the awareness of all forms of phenomenal appearances, and posits an identity obtains between these, which is none other than Brahman. It is thus language as a fundamentally ontological principle that accounts for how we are able to conceptualize and communicate the awareness of objects. The metaphysical notion of shabda Brahman posits the unity of all existence as the foundation for all linguistically designated individual phenomena.
Bhartrihari’s works were so widely known that even the Chinese traveler Yijing (I-Tsing) (635-713 CE) mentions the grammarian-philosopher, mistaking him for a Buddhist. Unfortunately, we do not know much about his personal history and his works do not throw much light on the matter. There are some narratives referring to his background but they are not supported by historical data. In these somewhat dubious accounts, he is said to have been existentially torn between two kinds of life: the path of pleasure and that of the monastic yogi. Although he believed that he should renounce the world of material pleasures (reflected in poetry attributed to him by scholars), it took many attempts to finally achieve the life of dispassion. His hedonism and philosophical acumen led him, according to his legend, to produce works of great breadth, depth and beauty.
Bhartrihari credits some of the theories in his work Vâkyapadîya to his teacher, who was probably one of Candrâcârya’s contemporaries, Vasurata. To be more precise, the noted scholar T.R.V. Murti proposes the following chronology: Vasurata, followed by Bhartrihari (450-510 CE) and Dinnâga (Dignâga) (480-540 CE). Among the major works attributed to Bhartrihari are his main philosophical treatise, Vâkyapadîya (On Sentences and Words) kândas I, II, and III, Mahâbhâshyatîkâ (a commentary on the Mahâbhâshya of Patanjali), Vâkyapadîyavrtti (a commentary on the Vâkyapadîya kândas I and II), and shabdadhâtusamîksha. Since 1884, the Vâkyapadîya, containing approximately 635 verses, has been edited and published several times in English translation.
The first two chapters of the Vâkyapadîya discuss the nature of creation, the relationship of Brahman, world, language, the individual soul (jîva), and the manifestation and comprehension of the meanings of words and sentences. In addition, the literary works attributed by some to Bhartrihari (not mentioned here) have made an impact on the growing popular Hindu devotional (bhakti) movements. More importantly, his philosophical work was recognized and addressed by schools of Hindu scriptural exegesis (Mîmâmsâ), Vedânta (mystical Vedism) and Buddhism.
In ancient India, grammarians saw their task as establishing the foundations of the Vedas, but their work often resulted in the development of their own philosophical systems. Patanjali, in his Mahâbhâshya, explains that the study of grammar (vyâkaranam) was meant to maintain the truth of the Vedas, to guide the use of Vedic speech in ritual contexts, and to aid in the clear interpretations of individual human speech. Both Pânini and Patanjali, two major Sanksrit grammarians, were the first to provide a systematic and formal analysis of the grammatical bases of all intended meanings. Pânini (7th century BCE) developed the Ashtâdhyâyî (Eight-Chapters) for the grammarians. This impressive work contains a thorough analysis of the rules of Sanskrit language down into its nominal and verbal components; it contains a science of language, applicable to the Vedas, also comprised of sets of operational rules and meta -rules that interpret the former. Among these “rules for interpretation” of Vedic texts, we are given a “universal grammar. Pânini’s approach is not like the Mîmâmsâ, which focuses on the study of Vedic language. Instead, Pânini deals with spoken and Vedic languages as if they are of the same genre.
Pânini’s Ashtâdhyâyî, its commentaries, and the Vâkyapadîya of Bhartrihari are said to constitute the fundamental texts for the school of Pânini’s grammar, whose object of study was ultimately Vedic. Around 150 BCE, Patanjali wrote the Mahâbhâshya, an interpretation of some of Pânini’s rules written in dialogue form, and it is this work that is the basis for later commentaries on grammar and philosophy. It is of interest to note here that the Dharmashâstras or Treatises on Law, including the well-known Laws of Manu, were composed between 322 and 183 BCE. J.N. Mohanty points out that these treatises can be seen as attempts on the part of orthodox Brahminism to preserve itself against the anti-Vedic philosophies. However, he considers Pânini’s grammar and Patanjali’s commentary to carry greater weight in the Indian philosophical tradition.
With the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari moves grammatical analysis squarely into the realm of philosophy, arguing that grammar can be consider a darshana, a “view,” or an official philosophical school, providing perspective and insight into ultimate reality. The first verse articulates the fundamental view of his newly envisaged school:
The Brahman is without beginning and end, whose essence is the Word, who is the cause of the manifested phonemes, who appears as the objects, from whom the creation of the world proceeds.
It is the project of the Vâkyapadîya to explain this verse, with all of its philosophical, linguistic, and metaphysical implications. At base, we contextualize Bhartrihari’s philosophical inquiry into language as being conditioned by the Indian culture and scriptural tradition, in which this type of intellectual pursuit had a soteriological purpose -the realization of absolute knowledge and the spiritual liberation which ensues; thus, it is a distinctively ontological reflection on language which Bhartrihari added to the thought of earlier grammarians.
The Brahminic view of the cosmos put forth in the Vedas is one of constant and cyclical creation and dissolution. At the dissolution of each creative cycle a seed or trace (samskâra) is left behind out of which the next cycle arises. What is significant here is that the nature of the seed from which each cycle of creation bursts forth is expressed as “Divine Word” (Daivi Vâk). If language is of divine origin, it can be conceived as Being Brahman expressing and embodying itself in the plurality of phenomena that is creation.
Bhartrihari considers Brahman, the basis of reality, to be “without beginning and end” (anâdi nidhânam), as a concept that is not subject to the attributes of temporal sequences of events, either externally or in the succession of mental events that form cognitions. The word principle, shabda Brahman, is not defined in terms of the temporal nature of our cognitive states, because it functions as the inherent, primordial ground of all cognitions. Thus, against the Hindu logicians, the Nyâyas, for whom particular forms of human speech may be expressed in conventional terms for practical purposes, language itself is not something which arises or is created in time by God or humans. As B.K. Matilal states, “To talk of an absolute beginning of language is untenable. Language is continuous and co-terminus with human existence or the existence of any sentient being.”
There has been some scholarly debate regarding the meaning of the term “eternal” or “akshara” as Bhartrihari applies it to the word-principle. While some interpret this to refer to an all-pervading entity, existing in opposition to the multiplicity of objects in space and time, others see it as Bhartrihari’s specialized way of referring to phonemes, the minimal units of meaningful sound. It seems that phonemes understood in this way explain how it is the case that Word appears as objects. Eternity is “that which appears as objects, and from whom the creation of the world proceeds.” Phonemes are thus the eternally possible elements that can be combined in inexhaustible ways to manifest the plurality of nature.
This principle accounts for creation on a number of levels: it is the origin of consciousness, of cognition, sensation, language use, cognitive and experiential aspects of the world. In other words, objects of thought and the relations between them are word-determined, regardless of whether they are objects of perception, inference or any other kind of knowledge. When we perceptually apprehend external reality, we always do so in terms of names, for without names objects are neither identifiable nor knowable.
Furthermore, when we consider phenomenal concepts, we see that they do not exist or hold any meaning aside from the words through which they are expressed; we might say that our concepts are “word-loaded” and from this we can infer that the word principle causes the world. Bhartrihari’s causal claim is in keeping with the traditional philosophical discussions on the nature of causality and inference as he applies it to the word-principle:
Just as other thinkers, while explaining causality, saw that the properties of cause continue in the effects….in the same way in the scriptures also, the word in which the power of Enjoyer and Enjoyed are submerged has been declared as the cause of the world.
In the Vâkyapadîya, kânda I, Bhartrihari defines the scope of his inquiry as the subjects of grammar. Our speech takes the form of the basic structures of language, and grammar deals with this communicatively spoken language. The correct understanding of speech can take us to the limits of our conventional and spiritual capacities, and so language analysis must operate at all the following levels: 1. sentences and words, 2. meanings corresponding to sentences and words, 3. the fitness or compatibility between sound and sense, and 4. the spiritual merit obtained by using the correct language.
In the Sanskrit grammatical tradition, the “elite” are defined as those who use the correct language; we arrive at this standard language by abstracting from communicative language, or “language-in-use.” In his linguistic theory, Bhartrihari distinguishes between two forms of language, the spoken, or “language-in-use” and the analytic. The analytic or formal language emerges from a formal, abstract analysis of communicative language. If we were to gather and compare various sentences and words from different contexts of use, we would logically infer the basic segments (roots, stems, suffixes) that account for a common logical or formal basis of denotation.
This hierarchical conception of language use and language meaning can be understood in the following way, taking off from a representation of Matilal, with the term on the far right of each column understood as the originator of the term in the middle, and the term in the middle being the originator of the term on the left. In other words, Bhartrihari’s conception of utterance and understanding can be grasped with the following schema under the rubric of:
|Linguistic Components||Language-in-Use||Analytic Language|
|sentences and words||word stems, suffixes, etc..|
|sense||sentence meaning and word meaning||stem meaning and suffix meaning|
|sound and sense relations||fitness compatibility||causality relations|
|purpose||spiritual merit||correct knowledge|
There is debate about the ontological and epistemological status of relations between these levels of language, and Bhartrihari’s commentary on grammar includes a review of several theories and ultimately he seems to favor the “naturalist view.” In the first chapter of the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari explains the naturalist view. Following the pâdavâdins (those who regard the word as the primary indivisible unit) who consider word-constituents, such as roots and suffixes, to be mere fictitious abstractions from words, so also the vâkyavâdins (those who regard the sentence as the indivisible unit) consider words to be imaginary abstractions from the sentence. The naturalists, such as Pânini, believe that language has an invariant form expressed in grammar. They therefore give epistemic primacy to spoken language; formal language is only an “appearance” and secondary aid to understanding. The conventionalists, on the other hand, hold that the analytic language is primary in that it contains within it all the structural features that may be used to create meaningful speech.
Bhartrihari’s theory occupies an interesting place in the ongoing Hindu-Buddhist debates about meaning and reference. For the Buddhists, meaning is a function of social and linguistic convention and reference is ultimately a projection of imaginative consciousness. For the Brahminic Nyâyas or Logicians, words have meaning because they refer to external objects; words can be combined in sentences just like things exist in relation to one another in external reality. With Advaita Vedânta, words mask the meaning of the Absolute Self (Âtman) which is Brahman, so that, when a person predicates categories to their identity such as in the sentence “I am tall,” this predication masks the all-inclusive nature of the eternal Self, which is beyond categorization. Bhartrihari puts forth a theory of language which, rather than starting by taking fundamental ontological, epistemological or social sides in these well-established debates, starts from the question of how meaning happens, how it emerges from the acts of both speaker and audience, and, constructing this theory first, what he believes to be appropriate metaphysical, epistemological and soteriological implications are drawn from it.
For Bhartrihari, linguistic meaning cannot be conveyed or accounted for by the physical utterance and perception of sounds, so he puts forth the sphota theory: the theory which posits the meaning-unit, which for him is the sentence, as a single entity. The term “sphota” dates back to Pânini’s reference to “sphotâyana” in his treatise Ashtâdhyâyî, however it was Patanjali who explicitly discusses sphota in his Mahâbhâshya. According to him sphota signifies spoken language, with the audible sound (dhvani) as its special quality. In Bhartrihari’s treatment of this concept, while the audible noise may vary depending on the speaker’s mode of utterance, sphota as the meaning unit of speech is not subject to such variations. This is so because for Bhartrihari, meaning is conveyed by the sentence. To explicate this theory, Bhartrihari depends on the root of sphota, namely sphut, meaning “to burst forth…” as in the “idea that spews forth” (in an internal mental state) when a meaningful sound, the sentence as a whole, is uttered.
The meaning of the sentence, the speech-unit, is one entire cognitive content (samvit). The sentence is indivisible (akhanda) and owes its cognitive value to the meaning-whole. Thus, its meaning is not reducible to its parts, the individual words which are distinguished only for the purposes of convention or expression. The differentiated word-meanings, which are also ontological categories, are the abstracted “pieces” we produce using imaginative construction, or vikalpa. Sphota entails a kind of mental perception which is described as a moment of recognition, an instantaneous flash (pratibhâ), whereby the hearer is made conscious, through hearing sounds, of the latent meaning unit already present in his consciousness (unconscious). The sentence employs analyzable units to express its meaning, but that meaning emerges out of the particular concatenation of those units, not because those units are meaningful in themselves. We analyze language by splitting it up into words, prefixes, suffixes, etc….but this is indicative of the fact that we “misunderstand” the fundamental oneness of the speech-unit. Words are only abstracted meaning possibilities in this sense, whereas the uttered sentence is the realization of a meaning-whole irreducible to those parts in themselves. This fundamental unity seems to apply, also, to any language taken as a whole. Matilal explains: “it is only those who do not know the language thoroughly who analyze it into words, in order to get a connected meaning.” As this scholar suggests, it is rather remarkable that Bhartrihari’s recognition of the theoretical indivisibility of the sentence resonates with the contemporary linguistic view of learning sentences as wholes (at a later stage of development we build new sentences from learned first sentences through analogical reasoning).
Sphota is therefore the cause of manifested language, which is meant to convey meaning. Sphota is more specifically identified as the underlying totality of linguistic capability, or “potency” and secondarily as the cause of two differentiated aspects of manifested meaning: applied meaning expressed as dhvani, the audible sound patterns of speech and artha-language as meaning-bearing. The grammatical/syntactical parts of the underlying sphota can only be heard and understood through its phonetic elements. Bhartrihari explains that the apparent difference between sphota and dhvani arises as we utter words. Initially, the word exists in the mind of the speaker as a unity but is manifested as a sequence of different sounds-thus giving the appearance of differentiation. dhvanis may be more specifically described as merely the audible possibility of meaning, a necessary but hardly sufficient condition of meaning.
We might think of this unit of linguistic potency, the sphota, as the cognitive/propositional whole content of meaning that can be transposed into different languages, while the actual word-sounds comprise the contents of the “speech-act”. But what holds the act to its ability to convey intended meanings? The words sounded by a plurality of speakers comprise the physical manifestation of vâk or vaikharî-vâk and it is upon this form of vâk that physical objects as objective forms are modeled. The unity that underlies these objective referents and meanings, however, is known as the intuited vâk-pashyati-vâk, which makes possible the unmediated understanding of a complete linguistic expression. This intuitive level of understanding, constitutive of the sphota, is teleological in its nature and structure in that it contains all potential possibilities of meaning-bearing dhvanis and their order of manifestation.
But, what guarantees that the hearer of speech properly comprehends what is uttered? In the second book of the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari states:
Sentence meaning is produced by word meanings but is not constituted by them. Its form is that Intuition, that innate “know how” awareness (pratibhâ) possessed by all beings. It is a cognitive state evident to the hearer…not describable or definable, but all practical activities depend on it directly or through recollection of it.
Pratibhâ intuition can be characterized as shabda, the very same speech principle externalized in the utterances of speakers, as it operates within the hearer, causing her to instantaneously comprehend the meaning of the utterance. However, linguistic convention, shared by speaker and hearer, cannot account for the flash of comprehension. If that were the case, we would not have instances where communication breaks down in spite of the shared language between speaker and hearer. The comprehension of meaning lies in the sphota that is already present in the hearer’s awareness. As she hears the succession of audible phonemes, the latent and undifferentiated language potency within her is brought to “fruition” in the form of grasping the speaker’s meaning. Thus, while the audible words are necessary for such verbal comprehension to occur in the hearer, they are not sufficient. It is her own ability to understand meaning referred to by these words, by virtue of sharing the same sphota with the speaker, which completes the act of cognition.
It is at this point that the philosophy of language has for Bhartrihari religious implications of both ontological and interpretive scope. Just as various sentences might sound different in the mouths of different speakers and yet convey the same meanings, various Vedas may seem different in form and style, but there is a unity carried by the underlying sphota, which ensures that it is the same truth, or dharma that is expressed throughout the texts. Bearing in mind that Brahman is the ultimate referent of all speech forms, this higher reality is manifested in the sacred texts-whose efficacy (ritual, soteriological, epistemological) depends upon our ability to correctly apprehend its meaning. The sphota concept makes such interpretation possible. Again, the sphota expresses a meaning-whole behind individual letters and words. The implication for the truth of Vedic discourse is clear, for that truth is already present in the speaker (the Veda) and is potentially present in the consciousness of the hearers (the practitioners).
According to Bhartrihari’s theory, we can justify this particular philosophical method as revelatory by using the concept of shabdapramâna. The implications of this method are explained in the following section; here, we examine the source of our cognitions. But in order for one to give their assent to a worldview that renders to language the cosmic and salvific roles Bhartrihari does, a theory that posits that language is the medium of ultimate knowledge, one must be convinced that language in general has the capacity to yield ordinary knowledge. Given the way Bhartrihari conceptualizes language, as not primarily referent directed, but instead as referent-constructing, we need to look at how the grammarian thematizes the knowledge-conferring power of language within his own peculiarly unique framework.
Sphota may be characterized as the intersubjective, universal “store-house” of meaning, the ground of all linguistic activity and communication. Sphota is the unifying principle that connects the word, the grammatical form of the word, and the meaning. Furthermore, just as words and sentences represent “pieces” of the meaning extracted from the whole, the objects and states of affairs these pieces represent actually refer to a “whole of objects meant” or an entire reality.
In classical Indian thought, objects are thought to be constituted of substance (dravya), but in Bhartrihari and especially in his first major commentator Helârâja, substance can be distinguished into two kinds, the substance of all things, which is Brahman, and the other individual, empirical substances. The empirical notion of substance here may be derived from the grammatical operation of ekashesha, explained by Pânini as using individual word-tokens to refer to individual objects-substances. Thus, names or singular terms are said by the earliest grammarians to refer to one substance at a time, therefore substance is defined through the relation of reference, and the nature of each substance is so specific that we cannot posit any general properties possessed by all of them. For example, each time we say the word ‘cow’ we refer to a different cow, and each cow is actually a different wholly individual entity.
Bhartrihari defines “actual” or empirical substance as that which we refer to by using indexicals and quantifiers, which refer to anything in our ontological reality: ‘this’ ‘that’ ‘something’ or ‘anything.’ The term ‘this’ points out an existence given to perception, while ‘that’ refers to something whose existence can be validated by some other means of knowledge but which is not available to perception. Bhartrihari also acknowledges the pragmatic and common sense view of “substance” as “a relative concept being dependent on our concept of quality (guna). A substance is that which is said to be distinguished and a quality is that which distinguishes the substance.
But Bhartrihari’s contribution to this debate changes the very notion of substance into a much more inclusive and general concept, since anything we refer to using a name or substantive term, even generic properties and verbs, become substances in that they are distinguished by words, as Matilal illustrates: “Thus, cooking would refer to the fact of cooking and ‘walking’ to the fact of walking as long as the speaker intends to distinguish the act of cooking from the act of walking.” “In the third book of the Vâkyapadîya, he defines the concept of ‘quality’/guna as dependent upon, as arising from substance. He rejects the Vaisheshika view that substances and qualities belong to entirely different categories (padârtha-s), and espouses the revolutionary view that the latter arises from the former. For him, qualities, existing in relation to substances serve to further differentiate those substances by “delimiting their scope.” But how does he account for such a radical revisioning?
Bhartrihari’s contribution of his particular theory of the “imaginative construction” of perceptions and language once again emerges within the context of debates with competing theories of knowledge. The Buddhist idealistic claim also argued that the world of experience or phenomena is at base a product of the human imaginative faculty. The Buddhists claim that our cognitive experiences construct our reality; these are modes of consciousness containing cognitive contents and in the final analysis, do not yield any knowledge about reality as it may be outside of themselves. It is consciousness that posits the (apparent) externality of objects, not the “objects themselves.” This form of phenomenal-idealism is developed as a counterclaim to the Hindu realist position, which affirms the existence of external reality. For the Buddhist, objects are only the external contents of the human imagination. Interestingly enough, Bhartrihari’s sphota theory of language and cognition is sometimes understood as an extension of the Buddhist position; according to the grammarian, cognition is entirely language-dependent in that the structure of our cognitive states is determined by grammar. But Bhartrihari’s theory posits knowledge as a matter of specifically linguistic construction. The concept of vikalpa for him implies the following: the structure of language shapes how we categorize the objects of our experience and our descriptions of reality as a whole. Even at the most immediate levels of awareness), we must conceptualize and therefore interpret the contents of sense perception. Thus, at the level of pure sensation, the sensory core is already saturated, as it were, with the “deep structure” of language. In this respect, Bhartrihari’s position differs from the Buddhist position rather dramatically. The Buddhists clearly distinguish between pure perception (nirvikalpa-pratyaksha), which is pre-conceptual, unverbalizable and correspondent to reality, and constructed perception (savikalpa-pratyakasha) that is conceptual and may therefore be considered a verbalized interpretation of the real. For the Buddhist, the pure sensory core is the real locus of perception. Bhartrihari, as an ontological monist, does not distinguish between a pure perception and a constructed perception such that the former is concept-free and ineffable and the latter concept-loaded and autonomously constructed, because he thinks that perception is inherently verbal. Not only are sense data and linguistic units non-different, but they are expressive of the unitary principle of Brahman-which is differentiated into the plurality of linguistic objects that make up the world.
Bhartrihari’s notion of vikalpa is also directed against the early Nyaiyayikas, who, while agreeing on the correspondence between word and thing, uphold the distinction between language and its object-referents. These Hindu Logicians held that the perceptual apprehension of the object could be distinguished from naming the object. For the Nyâyas, who are ontological pluralists and materialists, words refer to distinct generic properties of and relations between objects. Perception is a two-step process involving the initial apprehension of the object and then the subsequent apperception/awareness that results in mental and syntactic/linguistic representations of the first moment of awareness. Here, linguistic categories originate in the different substances and attributes that exist in the world. Bhartrihari counters them by arguing that the act of perception, rather than acquiring linguistic clothing after the bare particular has already been presented to consciousness, can only be aware of the object before it as a ‘this’ or ‘that’, that is, as an awareness of something only as a particular and as such, identifiable. That is to say, significantly enough, that for Bhartrihari, the word makes the thing an individual, and as one moves further and further along the refined categories of what is conventionally known as denotation, the word makes the thing what it is. For Bhartrihari, the difference the Logicians posit between the ontological and the linguistic would make meanings of all kinds, mundane ones and religious ones, contingent on the circumstances and speaker. But if perception is innately verbal, no perilous bridge need be suspended over some supposed abyss between vision and truth, both in our mundane lives and for the rishis who pronounced the Vedas. The word then makes the thing, and Brahman makes the world, and so it is entirely proper to speak of words as the creator of all things (shabda-Brahman).
Although previous Bhartrihari scholarship has progressed rather slowly due to numerous difficulties, within the last decade or so his work has garnered attention from Western scholars. Bhartrihari’s explorations into the relations between language, thought and reality reflect contemporary philosophical concerns with meaning, language use, and communication, particularly in the work of Chomsky, Wittgenstein, Grice, and Austin. His theory of language recognizes that meaning is conveyed in formalist terms where meaning is organized along syntactical rules. But it makes the leap, not made by modern Western philosophers, that such a view of language does not merely serve our mundane communicative purposes and see to the achievement of practical goals, but leads to paramount metaphysical knowledge, a knowledge carrying with it a palpable salvific value.
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 15, 2005 | Originally published: