Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Bhedabheda Vedanta

Bhedābheda Vedānta is one of the several traditions of Vedānta philosophy in India. “Bhedābheda” is a Sanskrit word meaning “Difference and Non-Difference.” The characteristic position of all the different Bhedābheda Vedānta schools is that the individual self (jīvātman) is both different and not different from the ultimate reality known as Brahman. Bhedābheda reconciles the positions of two other major schools of Vedānta. The Advaita (Monist) Vedānta that claims the individual self is completely identical to Brahman, and the Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta that teaches complete difference between the individual self and Brahman. However, each thinker within the Bhedābheda Vedānta tradition has his own particular understanding of the precise meanings of the philosophical terms “difference” and “non-difference.” Bhedābheda Vedāntic ideas can traced to some of the very oldest Vedāntic texts, including quite possibly Bādarāyaṇa’sBrahma Sūtra (app. 4th c. CE). Bhedābheda ideas also had an enormous influence on the devotional (bhakti) schools of India’s medieval period. Among medieval Bhedābheda thinkers are Vallabha (1479-1531 CE), founder of the Puṣṭimārga devotional sect now centered in Nathdwara, Rajasthan, and Caitanya (1485-1533 CE) the founder of the Gaudīya Vaiṣṇava sect based in the northeastern Indian state of West Bengal.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Overview
    1. Bādarāyaṇa and Bhartṛprapañca
    2. Bhāskara
    3. Yādavaprakāśa and Nimbārka
    4. Vallabha
    5. Caitanya
    6. Vijñānabhikṣu
  2. Ontology
    1. Part and Whole
    2. Aupādhika and Svābhāvika Bhedābheda
  3. Causality
    1. Pariṇāmavāda (Theory of real transformation)
    2. Vivartavāda (Theory of unreal manifestation)
    3. Satkāryavāda (Theory of pre-existent effect)
  4. Theology and soteriology
    1. God in Bhedābhedavāda
    2. Knowledge combined with ritual acts leads to liberation
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Overview

Bhedābheda is often presented as a school of Vedānta. Vedānta, in turn, is sometimes spoken about as a single philosophy, when in reality “Vedānta” has different uses. Its most inclusive use is as a label for a philosophy that purports to be expressed at length in the latter part of the Vedas, that is, the Upaniṣads. It is centrally concerned with the inquiry into the nature of an ultimate entity called “Brahman.” There are many different accounts of this synoptic philosophy, and the various accounts are often considered schools of philosophy themselves. Unlike the well-known schools of Advaita (Non-Dualist) Vedānta, Viśiṣṭādvaita (Non-Dualism of the Qualified) Vedānta, and Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta, it makes more sense to refer to Bhedābheda Vedānta as a “tradition” or “family” of philosophies rather than as a single “school.” This is because, unlike the three aforementioned schools, Bhedābheda has no single founder who created an institutionalized network of monasteries dedicated to the study, development, and propagation of the founder’s teachings. The history of Bhedābheda in India stretches back at least until the 7th century CE and likely quite earlier, and continues into the present day. Although there are substantial philosophical disagreements among the many Bhedābheda thinkers, their philosophies also show certain characteristic similarities. After a short historical introduction to several major Bhedābhedavādins, I will discuss a few viewpoints that almost all Bhedābheda schools share. These include the understanding of the relation between individual self (jīvātman) and Brahman as one of part and whole; the doctrine that the phenomenal world is a real transformation of Brahman (Pariṇāmavāda); and the doctrine that liberation can only be attained by means of a combination of knowledge and ritual action (Jñānakarmasamuccayavāda), not by knowledge alone.

a. Bādarāyaṇa and Bhartṛprapañca

Numerous scholars have concluded that Bādarāyaṇa’s Brahma Sūtra (circa 4th c. CE), one of the foundational texts common to all Vedānta schools, was written from a Bhedābheda Vedāntic viewpoint (Dasgupta 1922: vol. 2, p. 42; Nakamura 1989: p. 500). While that claim is disputed by other schools, there is little doubt that Bhedābheda predates Śaṅkara’s Advaita Vedānta. In his commentary on the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, Śaṅkara (8th c.) repeatedly criticizes interpretations by an earlier Vedāntin named Bhartṛprapañca, who characterized the relation between Brahman and individual souls as one of difference and non-difference. One of the central disagreements between the two is that Śaṅkara claims that Brahman’s entire creation is a mere appearance (vivarta), while Bhartṛprapañca maintains that it is real (Hiriyanna 1957: vol. 2, pp. 6-16).

b. Bhāskara

The first Bhedābhedavādin widely recognized as such by the later tradition is Bhāskara (8th-9th c.). He was either a younger contemporary of Śaṅkara or perhaps lived slightly after Śaṅkara. His only extant work is a commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. That work is expressly written in order to defend the earlier claims of Bhedābhedavādins against Śaṅkara’s interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra. Although he never mentions Śaṅkara by name, he makes it clear from the beginning that his primary intention in commenting on the Brahma Sūtra is to oppose some predecessor: “I am writing a commentary on thissūtra in order to obstruct those commentators who have concealed its ideas and replaced them with their own” (Bhāskara 1903: p. 1). Bhāskara is the earliest in a long line of Vedāntic authors concerned to refute Advaita (including Rāmānuja and Madhva, not to mention numerous Bhedābhedavādins). Many of the stock arguments used against the Advaita originated with Bhāskara, if indeed he did not borrow them from an even earlier source. He also seems to have been remembered by the collective Advaita tradition as a thorn in its side. So, for instance, in the 14th century hagiography of Śaṅkara, theŚaṅkaradigvijaya, Mādhava depicts one “Bhaṭṭa Bhāskara” as a haughty and famous Bhedābhedavādin whom Śaṅkara defeats in a lengthy debate.

c. Yādavaprakāśa and Nimbārka

While the Viśiṣṭādvaita philosopher Rāmānuja (11th-12th c.) is widely acknowledged as the most influential Vedāntin after Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja’s complicated relationship with Bhedābhedavāda is rarely discussed. Rāmānuja’s teacher Yādavaprakāśa was a Bhedābhedavādin. Yādavaprakāśa’s works have been lost, and therefore almost all of what we know of his ideas comes from Rāmānuja and one of Rāmānuja’s commentators, Sudarśanasῡri. However, it is possible from these numerous hints to draw a sketch of Yādavaprakāśa’s basic views. Rāmānuja depicts Yādavaprakāśa as an exponent of Svābhāvika Bhedābhedavāda, the view that Brahman is both different and not different than the world in its very nature, and that difference is not simply due to difference of artificial limiting conditions (see Oberhammer 1997: p. 10). Yādavaprakāśa shares this basic viewpoint with Nimbārka (13th c.?), and disagrees with the Aupādhika Bhedābhedavāda of Bhāskara, who maintains that the difference of the world and Brahman is due to limiting conditions. Another characteristic of Yādavaprakāśa’s thought is his repeated insistence that Brahman has the substance of pure existence (sanmātradravya). The relationship between Brahman and the world is not merely one of class and individual, but rather both are existent entities, standing in the relationship of cause and effect (see Oberhammer 1997: p. 14).

d. Vallabha

In the late medieval period, the doctrine of Bhedābheda became increasingly associated with devotional (bhakti) movements in North India. It is largely on the basis of their reputations as the founders of religious sects, and not as philosophers per se, that thinkers such as Vallabha (1479-1531) and Caitanya (1485-1533) became widely known. Among the former’s most influential works are a commentary on the Brahma Sūtraentitled the Anubhāṣya, and his commentary on the Bhāgavata Purāṇa, entitled theSubodhinī. Vallabha founded the Vaiṣṇava sect of the Puṣṭimārga (“path of nourishment”) now based in Nathdwara, Rajasthan. His philosophical system, called Śuddhādvaita (Pure Non-Dualism), takes its name from his view that there is no dualism whatsoever between a real Brahman and an unreal world. Since both are completely real, he denies that there can be any sort of ontological dualism of real and unreal between the two—therefore it is a “pure” non-dualism. Obviously, this refers to the Advaita school’s view that the phenomenal world is not real in an ultimate sense, and is a clever attempt to re-appropriate the valued label “Advaita” for his own school. Yet in this regard all Bhedābhedavādins might claim the name Śuddhādvaita, since they all assert the reality of the phenomenal world.

e. Caitanya

Caitanya was another medieval Vaiṣṇava philosopher/theologian, famous for a school of thought known as Acintya Bhedābhedavāda (Inconceivable Difference and Non-difference). Although Caitanya never wrote down his teachings, numerous followers authored works based on his philosophy, such as Jīva Gosvāmin, author of a well-known commentary on the Bhāgavata Purāṇa. This system’s notion of “inconceivability” (acintyatva) is a central concept used to reconcile apparently contradictory notions, such as the simultaneous oneness and multiplicity of Brahman, or the difference and non-difference of God and his powers. The tradition of Acintya-Bhedābheda, also commonly known as Gaudīya Vaiṣṇavism, thrives to this day in the Indian state of West Bengal. Perhaps the most famous offshoot of this devotional tradition is the International Society for Krishna Consciousness (ISKON), more popularly known in the West by the name the “Hari Krishnas.”

f. Vijñānabhikṣu

The last major Bhedābheda thinker in pre-modern India, Vijñānabhikṣu (16th c.), did not follow the path of bhakti. Vijñānabhikṣu sought to show the ultimate unity of the schools of Vedānta, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, and Nyāya, and is most well known today for commentaries on Sāṅkhya and Yoga texts. In his innovative sub-commentary on Patanjali’s Yoga Sūtra, Vijñānabhikṣu argues that yoga is the most effective means to liberation, although he never repudiates the Bhedābheda metaphysical framework of his earliest writings (Nicholson 2005). Vijñānabhikṣu was a theist who considered Viṣṇu the supreme God. In his commentary on the Sāṅkhya Sūtra, he argues that the Sāṅkhya school requires an omnipotent God in order to cause the union of its two fundamental principles, primordial nature (prakṛti) and pure consciousness (puruṣa). Vijñānabhikṣu grounds his reinterpretations of fundamental concepts in Sāṅkhya-Yoga in Bhedābheda metaphysics. In his earliest works, such as his Bhedābheda Vedāntic commentary on the Brahma Sūtras, he understands the concepts of difference and non-difference in terms of separation and non-separation (Ram 1995). Although for him the fundamental relation of the individual self and Brahman is one of non-separation, the Sāṅkhya-Yoga analysis of the individual selves as multiple and separate from one another is correct, as long as it is understood that this state of separation is temporary and adventitious. While Vijñānabhikṣu’s acceptance of Sāṅkhya-Yoga philosophical truths puts him at odds with some earlier Bhedābhedavādins, he continues in the tradition of Bhāskara in his trenchant criticism of the Advaita Vedāntins, whom he decries as “crypto-Buddhists” (pracchannabauddha) and “Vedāntins in name alone” (vedāntibruva).

2. Ontology

One of the most notable differences between Bhedābheda Vedānta and Advaita (Monistic) Vedānta is their views on the existence of the phenomenal world. While Advaita holds that the phenomenal world is ultimately unreal (mithyā) and that only Brahman truly exists, Bhedābheda thinkers insist that the phenomenal world is real, and not at all illusory. In this basic assertion they are in line with the majority of Indian philosophical schools, including the schools of Qualified Non-Dualist (Viśiṣṭādvaita) Vedānta, Dualist (Dvaita) Vedānta, Nyāya, Sāṅkhya, and Mīmāṃsā. Although Advaitins cite certain passages from the Upaniṣads as supporting the notion that the world is akin to a mirage or a magical trick, Bhedābhedavādins accuse Advaitins of borrowing this idea from the Mind-only (Cittamātra) school of Buddhism, and frequently employ the epithet of “crypto-Buddhist” (pracchannabauddha) to refer to Advaitins.

a. Part and Whole

Bhedābhedavādins understand the relation between Brahman and the individual souls to be a relation between a whole and its parts. They frequently employ stock examples to illustrate this relation. Some of the most common are a fire and its sparks, the sun and its rays, a father and his son, and the ocean and its waves. Each of these is an example of a part-whole relation, which is also a variety of difference and non-difference (Bhedābheda). So, to take one example, the sparks that come off of a fire are both the same as that fire and different from it. They are the same insofar as they came from the fire, and are constituted by the same substance as fire. But they are also distinguishable from the original fire, as occupying a separate point in space. Although these four examples each seem to illustrate a different relation (and it may seem to make no sense at all to understand a son as a “part” of his father), Bhedābhedavādins cite these familiar examples from the physical world in order to shed light on the true metaphysical relation between Brahman and the individual selves. While each might capture some aspect of that relation, inevitably they are mere approximations, requiring further commentary and philosophical analysis.

Advaita Vedāntins object to the characterization of the individual self as a part, and characterize Brahman as partless. All schools of Vedānta understand the Veda as the ultimate epistemic authority, and arguments from scripture play a large part in intra-Vedāntic disputes. Advaitins point out that both the Upaniṣads and the Brahma Sūtras say that Brahman is partless (niravayava, niṣkala). Furthermore, the assertion that Brahman has parts seems to defy logic. It is inconceivable that Brahman could be made up of parts, for things that are made up of parts are dependent on those parts, and impermanent. Advaitins offer their own stock examples to show that Brahman cannot be divided up, and that any such division is purely an artificial limitation on an indivisible entity. For example, Advaitins commonly liken Brahman to the element called “space” (ākāśa). According to traditional science in India, space is an element that is omnipresent in the world, just as all Vedāntins agree that Brahman is omnipresent. Although we can talk about space as being delimited (the space inside a room, the space inside a pot), such limitations of space are purely accidental, not essential to the element itself. It may appear to an observer that the space inside a pot and the space outside the pot are two different entities, but this is a misunderstanding of the fundamental nature of space.

The Bhedābhedavādins can themselves appeal to textual authority for the idea that the relation between Brahman and the individual self is a relation between a whole and its parts. In Brahma Sūtra 2.3.43, The individual self is referred to as a “part” (aṁśa), and Bhedābhedavādins cite this passage whenever they require a textual support for their views. However, Advaitins take this description of the relation as a figurative, and not literal description of the status of the individual self. Otherwise, this passage will conflict with Brahma Sūtra 2.1.26, which says that Brahman is “partless” (niravayava). For Advaita, the world appears as if to be made of parts. But when it is understood correctly, all of the many entities in the world are seen to be false, and only one entity, a single, partless Brahman remains. Bhedābhedavādins, in their assertion of the world’s phenomenal reality, insist that multiplicity is real. Brahman is simultaneously one and many, depending on the perspective from which it is viewed, just as the ocean can be described as one or many, depending on the perspective from which it is described. Bhedābhedavādins maintain that Brahman’s being made up of parts in no way diminishes the perfection of Brahman, just as the existence of waves in the ocean in no way diminishes the amount of water therein.

b. Aupādhika and Svābhāvika Bhedābheda

All Bhedābhedavādins maintain the reality of the phenomenal world and the multiplicity of individual selves. However, some Bhedābheda thinkers edge closer to the Advaita position by arguing that although multiplicity is real, it is in some way less real than the absolute unity of Brahman. The early Bhedābheda thinker Bhāskara (8th-9th c. CE) exemplifies this tendency to reduce the ontological status of the phenomenal world, while still maintaining its reality. Bhāskara’s philosophy is an example of Aupādhika Bhedābhedavāda (“Difference and Non-difference Based on Limiting Conditions”). According to Bhāskara, the one, absolute Brahman becomes finite and multiple by means of limiting conditions (upādhis). Just as a pure diamond appears to be red when it is placed next to a red flower, so too the absolute Brahman appears finite when it is transformed through limiting conditions. This transformation is a real one; the individual self really is finite, subject to ignorance, suffering, and bondage, so long as it is filtered through limiting conditions. Although the individual self is real as differentiated from Brahman, for Bhāskara difference is merely a temporary state. In its natural state, Brahman is one and not many. Although it undergoes limitations to become finite, the ultimate goal of the individual is to realize his or her absolute state. Liberation is precisely the removal of such limiting conditions.

At the other end of the spectrum from Bhāskara’s Aupadhika Bhedābhedavāda is Nimbārka’s philosophy of Svābhāvika Bhedābheda (Natural Difference and Non-Difference). For Nimbārka (13th c.), Brahman is different and non-different not because of artificial limiting conditions, but contains both non-difference and non-difference as its essential nature. Along with Yādavaprakāśa (11th c.), Nimbārka comes closest to upholding both difference and non-difference as equally real states of Brahman. The tendency among most Bhedābhedavādins, however, is to subordinate difference to non-difference. Although difference is a real state that Brahman undergoes as it transforms into multiple individual selves, Bhāskara in essence makes the state of non-difference “more real” than the state of difference. In this way, school of Bhedābheda Vedānta is often closer to the school of Advaita (Monist) Vedānta than it is to the school of Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta.

3. Causality

a. Pariṇāmavāda (Theory of real transformation)

Closely related to Bhedābheda Vedānta’s ontology is its theory of causality. Bhedābheda Vedāntins subscribe to the theory of Pariṇāmavāda, which states that the phenomenal world is a real transformation (pariṇāma) of the material cause of the world. They share this theory with the Sāṅkhya school of philosophy, as well as with most other schools of Vedānta. The major difference between the Vedāntic theory of Pariṇāmavāda and the Sāṅkhya’s Pariṇāmavāda is the understanding of what constitutes the material cause of the world. For Sāṅkhya, primordial nature (prakṛti) transforms itself into the phenomenal world. The principle of primordial nature is completely insentient, and the process of transformation that creates the world is a blind, automatic process. For Bhedābheda Vedāntins, Brahman is both the material and efficient cause of the universe. Brahman, unlike the Sāṅkhya’s prakṛti, is sentient. Yet both the sentient (individual souls) and insentient (physical things) have their origin in Brahman, according to Bhedābhedavādins. In spite of their apparent proximity to the Sāṅkhya school on the issue of causality, early Bhedābheda thinkers such as Bhāskara took pains to critique the Sāṅkhya notion ofprakṛti, accusing it of being both contrary to scripture and contrary to logic. A few later Bhedābheda thinkers took a softer line on Sāṅkhya. The most notable of these was Vijñānabhikṣu (16th c.), who argued for the ultimate unity of Sāṅkhya and Bhedābheda Vedānta doctrines.

b. Vivartavāda (Theory of unreal manifestation)

Once again, it is useful to contrast the doctrines of the Bhedābheda school with Advaita Vedānta. Advaita Vedānta maintains the doctrine of Vivartavāda, which states that the world is an unreal manifestation (vivarta) of Brahman. Advaita, like other schools of Vedānta, identifies Brahman as both material and efficient cause. But for the Advaitins, Brahman is the cause of an unreal effect. Although the world can be described as conventionally real (paramārthasat), the Advaitins claim that all of Brahman’s effects must ultimately be acknowledged as unreal before the individual self can be liberated. Although the theory of Vivartavāda is traditionally accepted as a theory shared by the entire Advaita school, some recent historians have questioned this, noting passages in the work of Śaṅkara, the founder of the Advaita, that appear to be closer to the theory ofpariṇāma (Hacker 1953: pp. 24ff.; Rao 1996: pp. 265ff.). It is likely that the theory ofVivartavāda is a theory that emerged gradually out of the earlier Vedāntic theory ofPariṇāmavāda, rather than one that sprang fully formed out of the head of Śaṅkara. It also bears repeating that some Bhedābheda Vedāntins come perilously close to the Advaita view of the phenomenal world as only conventionally real, as they often emphasize that multiplicity is an unnatural, temporary state.

c. Satkāryavāda (Theory of pre-existent effect)

Proponents of both Vedāntic theories of causality, Pariṇāmavāda and Vivartavāda, justify each by citing a central passage at Chāndogya Upaniṣad 6.1.4-5. There, the sage Aruni describes the nature of causality to his son, Śvetaketu, using the example of the relation of clay to a pot:

It is like this, son. By means of just one lump of clay one would perceive everything made of clay—the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s clay.’It is like this, son. By means of just one copper trinket one would perceive everything made of copper—the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s copper.’ (Olivelle 1996: 148)

This passage uses the examples of an everyday material cause, clay or copper, to shed light on the nature of cause and effect. It expresses the doctrine of Satkaryavāda, which says that the effect preexists in its cause. All Vedāntins subscribe to this theory—the doctrines of real tranformation (pariṇāma) and unreal manifestation (Vivartavāda) can be understood as two different versions of the theory of Satkāryavāda. According toSatkāryavāda, the lump of clay does not go out of existence when it is transformed into a pot, a cup, a saucer, or the like, only to be replaced by something entirely new. Although the form of the clay has changed, its essence, its clay-ness, remains. The same logic applies to everything caused by Brahman. The entire world, in all of its many forms, nonetheless shares the same essence, as being Brahman. This view, something like an early Indian theory of the conservation of matter, suggests that nothing ever arrives in the universe completely new, but only as a transformation of some earlier material cause. Nothing can be created ex nihilo. In this belief, the Vedāntins are at odds with the Buddhist and Nyāya schools, who for separate reasons argue that the effect does not preexist in the cause.

Although Bhedābheda Vedāntins and Advaita Vedāntins have the theory of Satkāryavādain common, they part ways when asked to characterize the status of the effect. Is the effect a real transformation (pariṇāma) of the cause, or merely an unreal manifestation (vivarta)? The passage at Chāndogya Upaniṣad 6.1.4-5 has been interpreted in both ways. Advaitins emphasize the apparent nominalism expressed by Aruni in this passage: “the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s copper.’” This might suggest that the effect is unreal, and only the cause is truly real. But Bhedābhedavādins see this passage as simply another instantiation of the principle of difference and non-difference, just as it is illustrated by the examples of a fire and its sparks or the sun and its rays. From one perspective, focusing on substance, we can say that all of the various cups, saucers, and plates are one—they are all clay. Yet at the same time, they have been transformed by the pot-maker into different forms, multiple in number, occupying different points in space. From this perspective, the effects are real. Just as the many pots, plates, and saucers are simultaneously different and non-different from the original lump of clay, so too all of the individual selves are both different and non-different from Brahman, the original material cause.

4. Theology and soteriology

a. God in Bhedābhedavāda

In the medieval period, Bhedābheda Vedānta became closely associated with theism in general, and the movement of bhakti devotionalism in particular. There is a reason thatbhaktas such as Vallabha (1479-1531 CE) and Caitanya (1485-1533) built the foundations of their theological systems on centuries-old Bhedābheda concepts. Like the schools of Rāmānuja and Madhva, Bhedābhedavāda is a realist school. Whereas in the Advaita school even God has to be understood as ultimately unreal, since He too is merely Brahman limited by the artificial condition of lordliness, certain types of Bhedābheda philosophy can accommodate a God who is real in his qualified (saguṇa) form. Although on a certain level, an Advaitin can profess a belief in God, he or she knows that ultimately God is merely a crutch, a heuristic to enable human beings to go one step closer to that ultimate Brahman devoid of qualities (nirguṇa). Such a God is ultimately unsatisfying for those whose primary interest is devotion—in any system of Advaita, devotion must occupy a lower position than pure knowledge. On the other hand, many worshippers will also be unsatisfied with the Dvaita school’s uncompromising notion that they themselves are completely separate from God, and that ultimate unification with the Godhead is impossible. Both Bhedābhedavāda and Viśiṣṭādvaita offer the possibility to bridge these two alternatives, by offering the alternative of both a real God possessing qualities and the possibility of personal participation in that Godhead.

b. Knowledge combined with ritual acts leads to liberation

Besides insistence that the phenomenal world is a real transformation (pariṇāma) of Brahman, another view shared by Bhedābhedavādins is the necessity of ritual acts in combination with knowledge (Jñānakarmasamuccayavāda) in order to obtain liberation. Bhāskara devotes much of the beginning of his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra to a critique of Śaṅkara’s radical view that knowledge alone is sufficient for the attainment of Brahman, as long as one has fulfilled one’s ritual requirements at an earlier stage. Although today polemics between Vedāntins are usually depicted in solely philosophical or theological terms, this suggests that above all, Śaṅkara’s new teachings were seen by other Vedāntins in the 8th century as a serious threat to the ritual-social order. Bhāskara’s arguments in favor of Brahmanic ritualism are an important reminder of the continuities between early Vedānta and the Pūrva Mīmāṃsā (Prior Exegesis) school of ritual hermeneutics. The two schools are so close that Sanskrit authors in pre-modern India typically refer to Vedānta by the names “Brahma Mīmāṃsā” (Exegesis of Brahman) or “Uttara Mīmāṃsā” (Later Exegesis), emphasizing the central importance of Vedic interpretation for all Vedāntic thinkers.

The notion of bhakti finds a home in Bhedābhedavāda, since Bhedābheda takes activity in the world (karman) seriously, believing that activities in the world are real, and produce real effects. But it should not be thought that all Bhedābhedavādins were proponents ofbhakti. The early Bhedābheda of Bhāskara was not concerned at all with bhakti. Instead, Bhāskara uses Bhedābheda conceptual terminology as a conservative apologist, to defend the importance of Brahmanical ritual orthodoxy from Śaṅkara, a radical who rejected the ultimate efficacy of Vedic ritual. It is only with Nimbārka, a Bhedābheda thinker heavily influenced by the bhakti system of Rāmānuja, that we first fully see the union of bhaktiworship and Bhedābhedavāda. Even in medieval northern India, where bhakti was influential and widespread, not all Bhedābhedavādins were bhaktas. Vijñānabhikṣu, for example, was more interested in espousing a modified, Bhedābheda Vedāntic form of Patañjali’s Yoga than he was to proselytize for the path of devotion. Such flexibility of the Bhedābheda philosophical apparatus has allowed it to survive as a living tradition for over 1500 years in a number of very different historical contexts. Although in the modern period Bhedābheda Vedānta has been eclipsed in popularity by neo-Vedāntic interpretations of Advaita Vedānta philosophy, its lineage continues today among traditional scholars in Puṣṭimārga and Gaudīya Vaiṣṇava religious communities. And, for the first time in its long history, in the early 21st century Bhedābheda Vedānta is beginning to receive the attention it deserves among historians, philosophers, and theologians outside of India.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bhāskara (1903). Brahmasūtrabhāṣyam, ed. Pandit Vindhyeshvari Prasada Dvivedin. Benares: Chowkhamba Sanskrit Book Depot.
  • Dasgupta, Surendranath (1922). A History of Indian Philosophyvol III. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
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Author Information

Andrew J. Nicholson
Stony Brook University
U. S. A.

Last updated: August 12, 2006 | Originally published: