Bioethics is a rather young academic inter-disciplinary field that has emerged rapidly as a particular moral enterprise against the background of the revival of applied ethics in the second half of the twentieth century. The notion of bioethics is commonly understood as a generic term for three main sub-disciplines: medical ethics, animal ethics, and environmental ethics. Each sub-discipline has its own particular area of bioethics, but there is a significant overlap of many issues, ethical approaches, concepts, and moral considerations. This makes it difficult to examine and to easily solve vital moral problems such as abortion, xenotransplantation, cloning, stem cell research, the moral status of animals and the moral status of nature (the environment). In addition, the field of bioethics presupposes at least some basic knowledge of important life sciences, most notably medicine, biology (including genetics), biochemistry, and biophysics in order to deal successfully with particular moral issues. This article also contains a discussion about the vital issue of moral status—and hence protection—in the context of bioethics, that is, whether moral status is ascribed depending on rationality, harm, or any other feature. For example, it might well be the case that non-sentient beings such as plants and unique stone formations, such as the Grand Canyon, do have a moral standing—at least, to some degree—and should not be deliberately destroyed by virtue of either their instrumental or intrinsic value for human beings. The last part contains a discussion of the main bioethical theories including their main line of reasoning and complex challenges in contemporary philosophy.
Rapid developments in the natural sciences and technology (including biotechnology) have greatly facilitated better living conditions and increased the standard of living of people worldwide. On the other hand, there are undesirable consequences, such as nuclear waste, water and air pollution, the clearing of tropical forests, and large-scale livestock farming, as well as particular innovations such as gene technology and cloning, which have caused qualms and even fears concerning the future of humankind. Lacunae in legal systems, for example, regarding abortion and euthanasia, additionally are a cause of grave concern for many people. Furthermore, moral problems which stem from a concrete situation, for example, gene-manipulated food, have given rise to heated public debates and serious public concerns with regard to safety issues in the past. There was—and still is—a need for ethical guidance which is not satisfied simply by applying traditional ethical theories to the complex and novel problems of the twenty-first century.
What are the general goals of bioethics? As a discipline of applied ethics and a particular way of ethical reasoning that substantially depends on the findings of the life sciences, the goals of bioethics are manifold and involve, at least, the following aspects:
In other words, bioethics is concerned with a specific area of human conduct concerning the animate (for example, human beings and animals) and inanimate (for example, stones) natural world against the background of the life sciences and deals with the various problems that arise from this complex amalgam. Furthermore, bioethics is not only an inter-disciplinary field but also multidisciplinary since bioethicists come from various disciplines, each with its own distinctive set of assumptions. While this facilitates new and valuable perspectives , it also causes problems for a more integrated approach to bioethics.
Historically speaking, there are three possible ways at least to address the history of bioethics. First, by the origin of the notion of bioethics, second, by the origin of the academic discipline and the institutionalization of bioethics, and third, by the origin of bioethics as a phenomenon. Each focuses on different aspects concerning the history of bioethics; however, one can only understand and appreciate the whole picture if one takes all three into account.
It is commonly said that the origin of the notion of bioethics is twofold: (i) the publishing of two influential articles; Potter’s “Bioethics, the Science of Survival” (1970), which suggests viewing bioethics as a global movement in order to foster concern for the environment and ethics, and Callahan’s “Bioethics as a Discipline” (1973), in which he argues for the establishment of a new academic discipline, and (ii) discussions between Shriver and Hellegers about the need for an institute in which researchers should examine and analyse medical dilemmas by appealing to moral philosophy (1970). This institute was created in 1971 as the Joseph and Rose Kennedy Center for the Study of Human Reproduction and Bioethics, and is now known as the Kennedy Institute of Ethics (see, also the Institute of Society, Ethics, and the Life Sciences, 1969). However, this oft-repeated story about the origin of the term bioethics is incorrect. Sass (2007) is right in claiming that the German theologian Fritz Jahr published three articles in 1927, 1928, and 1934 using the German term “Bio-Ethik” (which translates as “Bio-Ethics”) and forcefully argued, both for the establishment of a new academic discipline, and for the practice of a new, more civilized, ethical approach to issues concerning human beings and the environment. Jahr famously proclaimed his bioethical imperative: “Respect every living being, in principle, as an end in itself and treat it accordingly wherever it is possible,” (1927: 4).
The origin of the discipline of bioethics in the USA goes hand in hand with the origin of its institutionalization. At the beginning of this complex process, bioethics was seen as more or less identical with medical ethics−the latter notion is first mentioned by Thomas Percival (1803) −and was mainly conducted by philosophers, theologians, and a few physicians. Animal ethics and environmental ethics are sub-disciplines which emerged at a later date. In the beginning, the great demand for medical ethics was grounded in reaction to some negative events, such as the research experiments on human subjects committed by the Nazis and the Tuskegee Syphilis Study (1932–1972) in the USA. At that time, bioethics was rather driven by urgent cases (“putting out fires”) and did not consider systematic problems in healthcare such as the access to quality care. However, in reaction to these horrible events, the Nuremberg Code (1947) and the Declaration of Helsinki (1964) were created in order to provide researchers and physicians with ethical guidelines. In the case of the Tuskegee Syphilis Study (Belmont Report 1979), and other experiments in clinical research (Beecher 1966), one has to concede however that they were performed in the full knowledge of both sets of guidelines (and hence against the basic and most important idea of individual informed consent).
In particular, the idea of individual informed consent is due to the Prussian and German bureaucratic regulations of 1900/01 that appeal to the case of Dr. Albert Neisser in 1896 who publicly announced his concern about the possible dangers to the experimental subjects whom he vaccinated with an experimental immunizing serum (Zentralblatt der gesamten Unterrichtsverwaltung in Preussen 1901: 188). Additionally, the investigation of the death of 75 German children caused by the use of experimental tuberculosis vaccines in 1931 revealed that the mandatory informed consent was not obtained (Rundschreiben des Reichsministers des Inneren 28.2.1931, in: Sass 1989: 362-366). Baker rightly states that “the informed consent doctrine was thus originally a regulatory innovation created by Prussian bureaucrats; it was not an artefact of American legal or philosophical culture but of German bureaucratic culture. It was a German solution to problems created by the advances of German biomedical science” (Baker 1998: 250).
Furthermore, influential books such as Morals and Medicine: The Moral Problems of the Patient’s Right to Know the Truth, Contraception, Artificial Insemination, Sterilization, and Euthanasia (Fletcher 1954) and Ramsey’s ground breaking book, The Patient as Person: Explorations in Medical Ethics (1970) argued that there was a serious and urgent need for thinking about complex moral issues in medicine and thereby facilitated the creation of the new academic discipline of medical ethics (also known as bioethics).
Against this background, the Institute of Society, Ethics, and the Life Sciences (1969), later known as the Hastings Center, and the Joseph and Rose Kennedy Center for the Study of Human Reproduction and Bioethics (1971) were created. They were the first two (academic) institutions to conduct research in medical ethics and to publish high quality academic journals: the Hastings Center Report and the Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal. Many bioethics programs and degrees were established at universities in the USA during the 1970s and 1980s in order to provide students−most notably medical, law, and public policy students−with some expertise in medical ethics to deal with complex cases. In the early years, the bioethics programs were mainly funded by foundations such as the Rockefeller Foundation, the Russell Sage Foundation, the Ford Foundation and others, as well as by donations from individuals such as the Kennedy family.
The need for medical ethics experts and commissions was fostered by a series of important events in medicine, especially the Harvard Definition of Brain Death (1968), Roe v. Wade (1973), the Karen Ann Quinlan case (1975), and Baby Doe (1982). Since, most hospitals in the USA provide clinical ethics consultation that is mainly due to the requirement of The Joint Commission for Accreditation of Healthcare Organizations—in 2007 renamed the Joint Commission—that accredited hospitals must have a method for addressing ethical issues that arise (JCAHO 1992: 106).
Furthermore, new technologies in the life sciences caused new inventions and possibilities for the survival of the sick; kidney dialysis, intensive care units, organ transplantation, and respirators, to name just a few. Severe problems concerning the just distribution of health care resources emerged, for example, in access to kidney dialysis and intensive care units due to the consequences of scarcity, which caused much debate (concerning problems of resource allocation, for instance). The upshot is that the origins of bioethics as a discipline and its institutionalization can be traced back to the second half of the twentieth century in the USA. Other countries then adapted to the new situation and established their own bioethics programs and institutions.
The notion of bioethics and the origin of the discipline of bioethics and its institutionalization in academia is a modern development. The phenomenon itself, however, can be traced back, at least with any certainty, to the Hippocratic Oath in Antiquity (500 B.C.E.) in the case of medical ethics (Jonsen 2008) and possibly beyond if one considers the Code of Hammurabi (1750 B.C.E.), which contains some written provisions related to medical practice (Kuhse and Singer 2009: 4).
The idea that animals have a moral status (§4) and should be protected is based in modern moral philosophy, most notably utilitarianism, on the one hand, and the animal rights movement in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries in Europe (in particular, England and Germany) and the USA. On the other hand, Aristotle, Thomas Aquinas, and Kant had a lasting (negative) effect on the way people thought about animals and their moral status. According to Aristotle (400 B.C.E.), animals do not have a moral status and hence human beings cannot treat them unjustly. This line of thought was omnipresent during the time of the Romans and was reflected their great pleasure in animal hunts in the Colosseum and the Circus Maximus between the second century B.C.E. and the sixth century C.E. Researchers estimate that hundreds of thousands of animals were killed in order to please the public (“panem et circenses”). Only one incident is documented in the long and bloody history of cruelty against animals in Rome, when the audience sided with a group of elephants and proclaimed that the emperor showed cruelty to these majestic creatures, which was seen by the public as an “immoral act”. According to Thomas Aquinas (thirteenth century), who shaped the Christian view on the moral status of animals for several hundred years, animals have no moral status and human beings are allowed to use them for their own comfort since everything is made by God and subjected to the rule of human beings. Kant (eighteenth century) famously argued that animals have no moral status but one should treat them appropriately since cruelty against animals might have a negative effect on our behaviour towards our fellow humans, that is, the brutalization of human behaviour.
The idea of protecting nature/the environment is a contemporary thought that particularly evolved by virtue of public concern about the rapid technological developments in the twentieth century and the extreme dangers to the whole globe posed by these developments, for example, nuclear waste, water and air pollution, the clearing of tropical forests, and global warming. The point is, however, that a concern for bioethical issues is much older than the name of the phenomenon itself and the academic discipline.
Bioethics is a discipline of applied ethics and comprises three main sub-disciplines: medical ethics, animal ethics, and environmental ethics. Even though they are “distinct” branches in focusing on different areas—namely, human beings, animals, and nature—they have a significant overlap of particular issues, vital conceptions and theories as well as prominent lines of argumentation. Solving bioethical issues is a complex and demanding task. An interesting analogy in this case is that of a neural network in which the neural knot can be compared to the bioethical problem, and the network itself can be compared to the many different links to other vital issues and moral problems on different levels (and regarding different disciplines and sub-disciplines). Sometimes it seems that the attempt to settle a moral problem stirs up a hornets’ nest because many plausible suggestions cause further (serious) issues. However, a brief overview of the bioethical sub-disciplines is as follows.
The oldest sub-discipline of bioethics is medical ethics which can be traced back to the introduction of the Hippocratic Oath (500 B.C.E.). Of course, medical ethics is not limited to the Hippocratic Oath; rather that marks the beginning of Western ethical reasoning and decision making in medicine. The Hippocratic Oath is a compilation of ancient texts concerning the proper behaviour of physicians and the relationship between physician and patient. It also contains some binding ethical rules of utmost importance such as the well known principle of non-maleficence (“primum non nocere”) and the principle of beneficence (“salus aegroti suprema lex”); furthermore, doctor-patient confidentiality and the prohibition on exploiting the patient (including sexual exploitation) are important rules that are still valid.
Other more critical elements of the Hippocratic Oath such as the strict prohibition of euthanasia and abortion seem to be rather debatable and raise the vital question of how to distinguish between valuable and less valuable principles it proposes. In contemporary bioethics, euthanasia is—in general—widely regarded as an eligible autonomous decision of the patient that must be respected. With regard to abortion, most bioethicists believe that it should be allowed, at least, under certain circumstances, but this issue is still hotly debated and causes many emotional responses. The upshot is that one needs a more fundamental theoretical analysis of the particular elements of the Hippocratic Oath in order to determine possible traditional shortcomings in more detail before one accepts them as a fixed set of unquestionable professional rules. Furthermore, the idea that “the physician knows best” and should be able to act against the will of the patient for the benefit of the patient (that is, the patriarchal model of the physician-patient relationship) also originated in ancient times. The competence of the physician was too overwhelming for most people so that they almost always complied with the physician’s advice.
In medical ethics, one is concerned with the general ethical question of “what should one do” under the particular circumstances of medicine. In this respect, medical ethics is not different from basic ethics but it is limited to the area of medicine and deals with its particular state of affairs.
There are a number of important traditional issues in medical ethics that still need to be solved. These include beginning- and end-of-life issues (notably abortion, euthanasia, and limiting therapeutic treatments), the physician-patient relationship, research on human beings (including research ethics and human genetics). More recent medical issues include reproductive decision making, organ transplantation, just distribution of healthcare resources, access to healthcare, and most recently vital issues concerning healthcare systems and (global) public health. In the twentieth century, medical ethics was focused on−but not limited to− two main issues: the concept of personhood (for example, the Singer debate) and the principle of autonomy (that is, individual informed consent). The rise of autonomy in the context of the physician-patient relationship can be seen as the counter-movement to paternalism in healthcare. Both vital issues pervaded many debates in medical ethics in the past and can been seen as key issues that shaped the discussions in academia, at the theoretical level, and were highly influential on the ward, that is in practice, as well.
The history of ethics is to some extent a history of who is and should be part of the moral community. Roughly speaking, in Antiquity only men of a particular social status were part of the moral community; several hundred years later, after a long and hard social struggle women achieved equal status with men−even though there is still a long way to go in many parts of most societies (for example, in the job market and equal pay for equal work). The idea that animals should be part of the moral community mainly evolved in the context of the ethics of utilitarianism in the nineteenth century, most notably spearheaded by Jeremy Bentham, who famously argued that it does not matter morally whether animals can reason but rather whether they can suffer. In addition, animal rights groups were founded in the USA and Europe (in particular, in Protestant England and Germany) by virtue of a new awareness of sensitivity towards cruelty against animals (for example, vivisection) and a growing feeling of compassion for the suffering of animals in general (see Schopenhauer). This new paradigmatic moral shift was supported by the scientific findings of Darwin’s evolutionary theory. The findings undermined the sharp (empirical) distinction between human and animal posed by the traditional natural rights position that only rational human beings are part of the moral community (see also the objection of speciesism, §3d). Evolutionary theory provides convincing empirical evidence that there is a natural kinship between human beings and animals in the sense that human beings evolved from animals through a long, gradual process.
Current problems include research on animals (including vivisection), livestock farming and animal transports, xenotransplantation, human-animal chimera, meat eating versus vegetarianism/veganism, the legitimacy of zoos and circuses, religious freedom versus animal protection, recreational hunting, and the growing conflict between the protection of the environment and animal welfare. These pose complex moral issues that need to be addressed appropriately by responding to the question of whether animals have a moral status in general (and why), and, if they do, what their exact moral rank is.
All ethical viewpoints defending the protection of animals broaden the scope of the traditional position by claiming that the ability to suffer is the key point and hence sentient beings should be protected as part of the moral community. Two ground-breaking and highly influential books written by the utilitarian Peter Singer (1975) and Tom Regan (1983), who favors a Kantian-oriented approach, were the starting point of a more sophisticated discussion in academia and which also influenced many laypeople across the world. Singer argues for a utilitarian animal ethics based on the equal consideration of interests of sentient beings in combination with the criterion of the ability to feel pain. Regan claims instead that sentient beings who are able to see themselves as “subjects of life” do have an “inherent value” which provides them with strong defensible moral rights that implicate prima facie duties for human beings towards animals. Other ethical approaches contribute important insights as well. Virtue ethics calls for one not to undermine the aspiration of the good life by acting in a cruel way towards animals but acknowledge the animal-like part of one’s existence (Midgley 1984). Feminist care ethics implies animals stand in an asymmetrical relation of care and responsibility towards human beings (Donovan and Adams 1996). Discourse ethics implies animals are part of the moral community through the voice of a surrogate decision maker (Habermas 1997).
Generally speaking, environmental ethics deals with the moral dimension of the relationship between human beings and non-human nature−animals and plants, local populations, natural resources and ecosystems, landscapes, as well as the biosphere and the cosmos. Strictly speaking, human beings are, of course, part of nature and it seems somewhat odd to claim that there is a contrast between human beings and non-human nature. At second glance, however, it seems reasonable to make this distinction because human beings are the only beings who are able to reason about the consequences of their actions which may influence the whole of nature or parts of nature in a positive or negative way.
Ideas about the “right” conduct concerning the environment are as old as humankind but the establishment of environmental ethics as an academic discipline dates back to the 1970s when issues of vital importance emerged, such as the global threat to the natural basis of existence, the growing number of extinct species, the destruction of ecosystems and natural resources, as well as the more recognized dangers of technological inventions—for example, nuclear power, including its radioactive waste, and the new biotechnologies like genetic engineering. The exploitation of the environment was first justified by the religious teachings of the Old Testament (such as the stewardship of the environment in the Bible) and, during the secular period of the Enlightenment, supported by Francis Bacon’s scientific program to (rigorously) disclose all the secrets of nature. René Descartes’ famous and influential dualism of rational beings, on the one hand, and soulless matter, on the other hand, led to the debasement of nature, including animals, since the objects of morality were by nature rational beings only. The first serious counter-movement can be traced back to the Romantic philosophies of nature of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. In the non-Western context, the idea of respect for and valuing nature is more prevalent and at least 2500 years old, referring to the general teachings of Hinduism and Buddhism which influenced the Western view in Europe in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries (for example, Schopenhauer). Of course, contemporary environmentalists, particularly feminist ethicists and supporters of the idea of natural aesthetics, have refined the criticism of the traditional view by claiming that animals and nature are not valueless but deserving of moral protection.
It is possible to make the following broad distinctions regarding environmental ethics. Environmental ethics is commonly divided into two distinct areas: (i) anthropocentrism and (ii) non-anthropocentrism (or physiocentrism). Anthropocentric approaches such as virtue ethics and deontology stress the particular human perspective, and claim that values depend on human beings only. Values are relational and require a rational being, hence animals and non-human nature are not per se objects of morality, unless indirectly, by virtue of a surrogate decision maker. According to the anthropocentric view, only (rational) human beings deserve moral protection although one should respect and protect nature either for the sake of human beings (instrumental view) or for the sake of nature itself (non-instrumental view). Anthropocentrism is faced with the objection of speciesism, the view that the mere affiliation to the species of Homo sapiens is sufficient to grant a higher moral status to human beings in comparison with animals. Singer has powerfully claimed, however, that the “mere difference of species in itself cannot determine moral status” (Singer 2009: 567).
Non-anthropocentrism (or physiocentrism) mainly consists of three main branches: (1) pathocentrism, (2) biocentrism, and (3) ecocentrism, which can be further divided into an individualistic and holistic version. All non-anthropocentric approaches share the common claim that there are “objective” or more straightforward naturalistic values which are non-relational (intrinsic) and do not presuppose rational human beings. Nature (including animals) itself is valuable, independently of whether there are any human beings or not (non-instrumental view), even though one has to acknowledge the fact that many arguments about intrinsic value also have instrumental underpinnings. Supporters of pathocentrism argue that all sentient beings deserve moral consideration and protection, equally/egalitarian or non-equally/non-egalitarian with reference to human beings (see Singer 1975, Regan 1983, Wolf 1996). Adherents of biocentrism claim that all beings should be part of the moral community. Finally, supporters of ecocentrism argue that the whole of nature deserves moral protection, either according to an individualistic or holistic approach. If individualistically, all “things” in nature are bearers of moral values and are of equal moral worth. If holistically, there are traditionally at least three main positions: (a) ecofeminism, (b) deep ecology, and (c) the land ethics. Ecofeminists believe that there is a parallel between the systems of domination that affect both women and nature. Therefore, if human beings are willing to change the way they act towards nature, they must understand the real causes of the problem−the idea that nature is rather irrational and passive as well as needing to be controlled by human beings (Plumwood 1986, Warren 1987). According to deep ecologists, human beings should view themselves as being a part of and not distinct from the natural world by virtue of a refined notion of the self. All living things, according to the founder of deep ecology, Arne Naess, have an equal right to flourish (“biospherical egalitarianism”). Proponents of the land ethics argue that one should stop treating the land as a mere resource, but view it as a precious source of energy. Aldo Leopold, the founder of land ethics, famously claims: “A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise.” (Leopold 1949/1989: 218-225).
Bioethical debates, particularly in animal ethics and environmental ethics, are concerned with issues of moral status and moral protection. The vital question is, for example, whether all animals have a moral status and hence are members of the moral community enjoying moral protection or whether they do not have a moral status at all (or only to some degree for some animals, such as higher mammals such as great apes, dolphins and elephants). But, even if animals do not have a moral status and hence have no moral rights, it could be the case that they still are morally significant in the sense that human beings are not allowed to do whatever they want to do with them (for example, to torture animals for fun). The fundamental idea of granting a living being a moral status is to protect the particular being from various kinds of harm which undermine the being’s flourishing. For example, one can protect the great apes by granting them a moral status which is important for their survival since one can then legally enforce their moral right not to be killed.
But what are the prerequisites for ascribing a being a moral status and hence moral rights and (legal) protection? And, furthermore, what about non-sentient nature, such as tropical rainforests, the Grand Canyon, mammoth trees, and beautiful landscapes? Do they have a moral status as well? Are they morally significant at least to some degree? Or are human beings allowed to do whatever they want to do with non-human nature?
Traditionally, philosophers made the distinction between sentient beings and non-sentient beings (including the environment) and argued that only beings who have an intrinsic worth are valuable and hence deserve moral concern and (legal) protection. Therefore, it is the intrinsic worth of the particular being that is important for the ascription of the being’s moral status as well as the being’s moral and legal protection. If a being has no intrinsic worth, then it has no moral status, and so forth. It has been commonly argued that the intrinsic worth of a being can be fleshed out by claiming that it is rationality or the capacity to reason which is the underlying motif for ascribing “intrinsic worth” (for example, Kant). This line of reasoning is anthropocentric and is faced with the objection of speciesism (§3d). A somewhat different view is, for example, to claim that even the Grand Canyon has an intrinsic worth by virtue of its uniqueness and great beauty. In this respect, the notion of intrinsic worth is fleshed out by the idea of uniqueness and beauty and hence one avoids (to some degree) anthropocentrism and the objection of speciesism. But, on the other hand, this position seems questionable for at least two important reasons. First, “being unique” seems to be of no moral importance at all. For example, if a dog was born with two heads, one might say that this is unique but it would seem awkward to grant the dog protection by virtue of his two heads. Rather, one would be more likely to protect him in order to study the dog’s particular abnormality. This, however, has nothing to do with the dog’s supposed intrinsic worth based on his uniqueness but everything to do with his instrumental value for some scientists. Secondly, to say that something (or someone) is “beautiful” seems to presuppose a sentient being that values the particular thing in the first place; hence we are not concerned with an intrinsic worth but rather with an instrumental worth with reference to a particular valuer. According to this reasoning, the Grand Canyon should be protected since it causes great experiences in people who stand in awe of this landscape when they appreciate the great beauty of it and simply feel good about it.
Some scholars argue that one has to be cautious of examining the moral status of non-human nature through the lens of a purely anthropocentric line of reasoning because it conceptually downplays the value of animals and the environment right from the start. However, on the other hand, many people find it questionable to argue for the moral rights of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms. Even so, it seems plausible to consider that there might be a significant distinction between the moral status of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms by virtue of their instrumental value for human beings. For example, the Grand Canyon might have a certain moral status because this unique stone formation makes human beings not only view it with awe, but also aesthetically admire it, which is the reason not to deliberately destroy the Grand Canyon. Sunflowers are nice to look at and hence are enjoyable for human beings, therefore one should not deliberately destroy them; earthworms are useful for the thriving of plants (including sunflowers) which is good both for animals and human beings since they loosen the ground, and hence they should not be deliberately destroyed as well. The differing moral status of stones, sunflowers, and earthworms—if there is any—could then be eventually ranked according to their particular instrumental value for human beings. Or one could argue that stones, sunflowers, and earthworms have an intrinsic (that is, non-instrumental) value in so far as they are valuable as such. Then, a possible ranking concerning their moral status might either depend on their supposed usefulness for other entities (a case of intrinsic value with instrumental underpinnings) or on a fixed general order of non-instrumental values: first, animals, second, animated plants, and third, the most inanimate, such as stones. Against this fixed order, however, some people could object that mammoth trees—the gigantic several hundred years old majestic trees—should be ranked higher than simple earthworms because they are very rare and make human beings view them with awe. That is, it might well be the case that sometimes animated plants such as majestic mammoth trees morally outweigh lower forms of animals such as earthworms. Furthermore, one could even argue, then, that the Grand Canyon morally outweighs a group of majestic mammoth trees and so forth. As a result, it seems reasonable to acknowledge the fact that there is no easy way to determine: (1) The exact moral status between different life forms within the animated group, as well as the moral status between the animated and the most inanimated in non-human nature, and (2) the exact moral status between human and non-human nature, if one does not hold the view that human beings have the same moral standing as animals and plants (that is, human beings and non-human nature).
Thus, one might eventually conclude that, in general, morally appropriate conduct towards non-human nature should focus on paying attention to the many details of the particular case and the consequences of one’s actions. In sum, do no premeditated harm (for example, do not torture animals for fun, restrain large-scale livestock farming), preserve nature wherever it is possible (by, for example, avoiding water and air pollution and protecting tropical rainforests from clearing). As Hans Jonas famously put it, be responsible in your dealings with non-human nature.
Bioethics is an important inter-disciplinary and rapidly emerging field of applied ethics. The traditional but deficient view concerning ethical reasoning and decision making in applied ethics is that one simply “applies” a particular ethical theory such as utilitarianism or deontology in a given context such as business (business ethics), politics (political ethics), or issues related to human health (medical ethics) in order to solve the moral problem in question. This top-down approach of ethical reasoning and decision making adheres to the idea that ethics is quite similar to geometry, in that it presupposes a solid foundation from which principles and general rules can be inferred and then applied to concrete cases independent of the details of the particular case. The locus of certitude, that is, the place of the greatest certainty for principle ethics—approaches using one master principle—concerns its foundation; the reasonableness of the ethical decision is passed on from the foundation itself.
This picture is awry. In the twentieth century it was clearly shown that the traditional ethical theories had great difficulty in solving the new contemporary problems such as nuclear power and its radioactive waste, issues related to the new biotechnologies (for example, genetic enhancement, cloning), and so on. The consequences were, first, that the two main classical theories in principle ethics—deontology and utilitarianism—were modified in order to deal more properly and successfully with the new situation. For example, Christine Korsgaard modified Kantianism and Richard Hare modified utilitarianism. Secondly, new approaches of ethical reasoning and decision making were developed, such as Beauchamp and Childress’s four-principle approach in bioethics and feminist bioethics. Casuistry and virtue ethics—the bottom-up approaches—were rediscovered and refined in order to examine complex bioethical issues. The rise of applied ethics in general and the rise of bioethics in particular has been faced with an overwhelming variety of details and complex circumstances with regard to the rapidly emerging ethical issues against the background of the fast development of new technologies and the process of globalization, accompanied by an awakening of individual autonomy and the rejection of being submissive to authority. Sound ethical approaches in applied ethics must at least fulfill two criteria: (1) They must be consistent and (2) they must be applicable. These are the minimum conditions for any successful ethical theory in applied ethics.
In addition, one might raise the issue of reaching an agreement about what to do in practice against the background of competing moral theories. There is a twofold response to this well-known problem. First, most cases (for example, clinical ethics consultations, commission work, and so forth) reveal that there is a broad consensus among people concerning the results (practical level) but that they—quite often—differ considerably in their justifications at the theoretical level. Secondly, it might well be the case—as some scholars such as Gert and Beauchamp claim—that some people without adhering to moral relativism have equally good reasons about what to do in practice but, nonetheless, still differ about what and why it should be done. Contrary to the first response, the second response is more alarming since the idea that people could have equally good reasons for differing suggestions seems odd, at least at first sight. At second glance, however, moral judgements might not only depend on pure reason alone but are influenced by different cultures, religions, and traditions that would substantiate the claim of different outcomes and justifications. Whether one is, then, necessarily committed to a form of moral relativism can be reasonably questioned since one can still make the convincing distinction between a hard core of moral norms that is universally shared (for example, that one should not commit murder or lie and that one should help people in need) and other moral norms which are non-universal by nature. If that is correct, then this would solve the issue of moral relativism.
The following brief depiction of (bio)ethical theories, including their main points of criticism, provides an overview of the approaches (see also Düwell and Steigleder 2003: 41-210; Kuhse and Singer 2009: 65-125).
Deontological approaches such as provided by Kant (1785) and Ross (1930) are commonly characterized by applying usually strict moral rules or norms to concrete cases. Religious approaches, such as those of the Catholic Church, and non-religious deontological approaches, such as Kantian-oriented theories, are prime examples of applying moral rules. For example, the (extreme) conservative position of the Catholic Church justifies that one should not abort fetuses, under any circumstances, including in cases of rape (Noonan 1970) and forbids the use of condoms. Furthermore, the Catholic Church regularly defends its strict religious position in end-of-life cases to prolong human life as long as possible and not to practice euthanasia (or physician-assisted suicide) because human life is sacred and given as a gift from God. In this respect, religious approaches are necessarily faced with the objection of speciesism, if they claim that it is sufficient to be a member of the human species in order to be protected. Kantian-oriented approaches, instead, are not necessarily faced with this objection because—at least, in the original version—moral status is assigned according to “rationality” and not according to “membership of the human species”. Other Neo-Kantian deontological approaches, however, might emphasize “human dignity” and hence run into serious troubles with regard to the objection of speciesism as well. In other words, there is a fundamental disagreement inherent in the notion of human dignity—roughly, the idea that there is something special about human beings—and the ascription of moral status to non-human nature such as animals and plants.
Kantian-oriented deontological approaches (or Kantianism) generally adhere to the basic Kantian ideas of respect for persons and human dignity; both central ideas are rooted in the human being’s capacity to act autonomously. Kantianism has been adopted in order to provide a justification for strict truth telling in medical contexts, for example, in cases of terminal cancer, bedside rationing, and medical experiments. This development can be seen as a counter-movement against previous malpractice. The former practice consisted in not telling the truth to the patient in order either not to cause additional harm or not to undermine the goals of the medical experiments (for example, the Tuskegee Syphilis Study). In the late 20th century, this has changed by virtue of acknowledging the patient’s right to be told the truth about his or her health condition. Likewise, regarding the patient’s involvement in research studies—including research with placebos—in order to enable the patient to make adequate autonomous decisions (that is, individual informed consent). The second formula of Kant’s Categorical Imperative—“Act in such a way that you treat humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, never merely as a means to an end, but always at the same time as an end” (Kant 1785/1968)—has been successfully used in different medical contexts in order to avoid abuses. In particular, it is nowadays used to avoid abuses in research experiments on human subjects. The sad examples of the Tuskegee Syphilis Study and the Human Radiation Experiments clearly show the dangers of researchers acting in a highly dubious and immoral way (see, The Belmont Report 1979). Additionally, deontological approaches have been used in the fields of animal ethics (Regan 1983, Korsgaard 1996, 2004, Wood 1998) and environmental ethics (Taylor 1986, Korsgaard 1996). Altman (2011) offers a thorough examination of the strengths and weaknesses of Kant’s ethics concerning a vast range of important bioethical issues in contemporary applied ethics.
Genuine religious approaches are problematic by virtue of their strong commitment to religious presuppositions such as the existence of God as the ultimate source of morality or the absolute sacredness of the human life. In modern—or rather secular—societies, this line of reasoning cannot be taken as a universal starting point to justify moral norms for religious and non-religious people alike in medical contexts on issues such as abortion, euthanasia, the use of contraceptives, and genetic enhancement. Despite the prima facie reasonableness of Kantian-oriented deontological approaches in cases concerning truth telling and in the context of medical exploitation, they particularly suffer from using moral norms too general and abstract to be applied without difficulty or stiltedness to concrete cases. The upshot is that deontological approaches are less effective at providing adequate guidance since their application is too complex and possibly misleading (for a different view, see Altman 2011) or causes strong counter-intuitive intuitions in the case of religious positions.
One of the most prominent and influential ways of ethical reasoning and decision making in the field of bioethics is based on utilitarianism. In the late twentieth century, utilitarian approaches were so influential that many people outside academia believed that all bioethicists were utilitarians. Utilitarianism, in fact, contains a wide range of different approaches, but one can distinguish four important core elements that all utilitarian approaches have in common:
Utilitarian approaches in bioethics were spearheaded by Singer (1979) and Harris (1975) and carried on by, among others, Savulescu (2001, 2002) and Schüklenk (2010). Such approaches in bioethics are less concerned with public welfare than other vital aspects, such as: (1) debunking the traditional religious views on the sacredness of human beings, the prohibition of abortion, infanticide, and euthanasia; (2) stressing the importance of non-rational sentient animals (animal ethics) and the preservation of nature (environmental ethics) against anthropocentric approaches such as Kantianism and religious approaches; (3) arguing against the use of human rights and human dignity in bioethical discourses; (4) maximizing the patient’s well-being or best interests in medicine. In this context, utilitarians claim that one should focus on the patient avoiding pain and suffering, and therefore one should, for example, allow terminally ill patients to obtain physician-assisted suicide. Furthermore, the religious idea that human life is sacred and hence must be protected from the moment of conception is rejected by utilitarians who believe that religious claims are unsubstantiated and incompatible with the requirements of a modern, secular nation-state (for example, research on human embryos and genetic enhancement should be made possible). In addition, abortion and infanticide in cases where the baby has a severe disability should be possible depending on the circumstances of the particular case and by appealing to the idea of personhood (Singer 1979, Kuhse and Singer 1985, Giubilini and Minerva 2012). According to Singer, one should not be allowed to kill a human being or sentient animal if one can detect in that being rationality and self-consciousness—the core elements of personhood according to Singer. To treat sentient animals with interests differently than human beings is speciesism which is comparable to sexism and racism and must be avoided. Moral judgements, according to utilitarians, should always be impartial and universal. Singer (1975) additionally claims that human beings must consider the equal interests of human beings and animals alike.
The general idea to always maximize the patient’s well-being according to a rather simplistic idea of calculating and comparing the pleasures and pains of all affected persons seems questionable to many people since they do not think that the outcome of these calculations necessarily leads to morally right or wrong actions. Furthermore, the claim that the killing of an innocent being in the case of a fetus with a (severe) disability might be the best possible outcome in some situations—by adhering to “the good life” doctrine—seems to undermine some important values of living together (compassion, care, responsibility for the weak, justice). In addition, the idea that minority groups such as people with (severe) disabilities and patients in a permanent vegetative state can be legitimately sacrificed in some cases has led to a rather bad reputation for utilitarian approaches. Utilitarians are also at odds with approaches in bioethics that appeal to human dignity and human rights. Two centuries ago, Bentham famously stated that natural rights (or human rights) are “nonsense upon stilts,” a dictum most utilitarians still regard as reasonable.
One of the most important approaches in bioethics or medical ethics is the four-principle approach developed by Tom Beauchamp and James Childress (1978, latest edition 2009). Since then they have continually refined their approach and integrated the points of criticism raised by their opponents, most notably Gert et al. (1990). The four-principle approach, often simply called principlism, consists of four universal prima facie mid-level ethical principles: (1) autonomy, (2) non-maleficence, (3) beneficence, and (4) justice. Together with some general rules and ethical virtues, they can be seen as the starting point and constraining framework of ethical reasoning and decision making (“common morality”). According to Beauchamp and Childress:
The common morality is the set of norms shared by all persons committed to morality. The common morality is not merely a morality, in contrast to other moralities. The common morality is applicable to all persons in all places, and we rightly judge all human conduct by its standards. (2009: 3)
Particular moralities, instead, contain non-universal moral norms which stem from different cultural, religious, and institutional sources. These norms—unlike the abstract and content-thin principles of the common morality—are concrete and rich in substance. Beauchamp and Childress use the methods of specification and balancing to enrich the abstract and content-thin universal principles with empirical data from the particular moralities. The method of specification is, according to Beauchamp,
…a methodological tool that adds content to abstract principles, ridding them of their indeterminateness and providing action-guiding content for the purpose of coping with complex cases. Many already specified norms will need further specification to handle new circumstances of indeterminateness and conflict. (Beauchamp 2011: 301)
The method of balancing, instead, is important for reaching sound judgements in individual cases and it can be seen as “the process of finding reasons to support beliefs about which moral norms should prevail” (Beauchamp and Childress 2009: 20). Since the particular moralities are different, people sometimes specify and balance the principles differently, and hence principlists often claim “that there can be different and equally good solutions to moral problems” (Gordon et al. 2011: 299).
Even though the four-principle approach certainly belongs to the most prevalent, authoritative, and widely used bioethical approaches, this approach has not been unquestioned and has provoked serious objections. The three most important objections are: first, the lack of ethical guidance because there is no master principle in cases of conflict among the principles (Gert et al. 1990); secondly, the problem of bias concerning the universal principles in cross-cultural contexts (Takala 2001, Westra et al. 2009, Gordon 2011), and thirdly, the objection that the four-principle approach is a mere checklist of considerations and so methodologically unsound (Gert et al. 1990).
The revival of virtue ethics in moral philosophy in the last century was most notably spearheaded by Anscombe (1958), MacIntyre (1981), Williams (1985), Nussbaum (1988, 1990), and more recently Hursthouse (1987, 1999), Slote (2001), Swanton (2003), and Oakley (2009). This approach also deeply influenced the ethical reasoning and decision making in the field of bioethics, particularly in medical ethics (for example, Foot 1977, Shelp 1985, Hursthouse 1991, Pellegrino 1995, Pellegrino and Thomasma 2003, McDougall 2007).
The general idea of virtue ethical approaches in bioethics is that one should act in accordance with what the virtuous agent would have chosen. In more detail, an action is morally right if it is done by adhering to the ethical virtues in order to promote human flourishing and well-being; the action is morally good if the person in question acts on the basis of the right motive as well as his or her action is based on a firm and good character or disposition. That means an action that is morally right (for instance, to help the needy) but performed according to the wrong motive (such as to gain honour and reputation) is not morally good. The right action and the right motive must both come together in virtue ethics. For a detailed view of how contemporary virtue ethics focuses on action and the rightness of action against the background of the general idea of living a good life, see in particular Hursthouse (1999: chapters 1-3), Swanton (2003: chapter 11), and Slote (2001: chapter 1).
Generally speaking, virtue ethical approaches put a lot of weight on the particular agent. For example, the virtuous physician in medical ethics should not only be a well trained and conscientious professional—one who shows compassion towards his or her patients, is helpful and honest, and keeps his or her promises—but also should be strongly inclined to promote the patient’s well-being even at his or her own expense (Pellegrino 1989). The virtuous agent in bioethics knows how to deal with complex cases, shows a greater sensitivity than proponents of deontological and utilitarian approaches, and acts virtuously not only by complying with moral norms but also “going the extra mile” to perform supererogatory actions. Virtue ethical approaches have been applied in medical ethics by, for example, Foot on euthanasia (1977), Lebacqz on the virtuous patient (1985), Hursthouse on abortion (1991), Oakley and Cocking on professional roles (2001), and Holland on virtue politics (2011). The role of virtue ethics in the field of environmental ethics has been examined by Frasz (1993) and Hursthouse (2007), and in the field of animal ethics by Hursthouse (2011) and Merriam (2011).
It is a matter of debate (see for example, Kihlbom 2000, Holland 2011), whether the strengths of virtue ethical approaches are limited to single cases (individual level) or whether they are also equally good candidates in cases of developing biomedical procedures for regulatory policy (societal level). In addition, Jansen (2000), for example, argues that virtue ethical approaches face two serious problems, which cannot be sufficiently resolved by adhering to virtue ethics. First is the problem of content: vague virtues are unable to give proper guidance. Second is the problem of pluralism: competing conceptions of the good life complicate a sound solution. Virtues only have a limited function; for example, in the context of medicine they should enable the physician to become a virtuous practitioner abiding by the right motive. But, even in this case, Jansen claims that the right action should prevail over the right motive. Furthermore, sometimes opponents such as Jansen (2000) claim that virtues are relative by nature and hence lack proper guidance in the context of global bioethics (the “problem of cultural relativity”). However, Nussbaum (1988) argues persuasively, by appealing to Aristotle, that ethical virtues are non-relative by nature and allow for variations.
The revival of casuistry as an inductive method of ethical reasoning and decision making in the second half of the twentieth century coincides with a wide and persistent critique of principle-oriented approaches, most notably principlism, deontological ethics, and utilitarianism in bioethics. Casuistry had its historical heyday in moral theology and ethics during the period from the fifteenth to the seventeenth century in Europe. After a long time of no importance or influence in moral philosophy, it gained a significant importance in bioethics—mostly in clinical ethics—after the vital publications of Jonsen and Toulmin (1988), Strong (1988), and Brody (1988). Casuists attack the traditional idea of simply applying universal moral rules and norms to complex cases in order to solve the problem in question—that is, a moral theory justifies a moral principle (or several principles) which in turn justifies a moral rule (or several rules) which in turn justifies the moral judgement concerning a particular case. The circumstances make the case and are of utmost importance in order to yield a good solution (see moral particularism).
Whether the casuists’ solution always leads to an open-and-shut case appears questionable and depends largely on the paradigm cases and analogies that are used to determine and evaluate the case in question as well as the skills of the particular casuist (in finding proper paradigm cases and analogies, and so on.). For example, Strong (1988) claims that it might be that a complex case lies right in between two reference cases and hence one is unable to find a clear solution; in such a case different solutions might be equally justified. In general, casuists argue that universal principles and rules are unable to solve complex cases in a sufficient way since the complexity of the moral life is too great (for example, Toulmin 1982, Brody 1988). The general strategy in casuistry can be described as follows:
Case sensitivity and the (partial) integration of cultural and community bound values and expectations are, in general, advantageous in ethical reasoning and decision making. But it seems equally true that this approach presents some difficulties as well. As critics such as Arras (1991), Wildes (1993), and Tomlinson (1994) have argued, it is impossible to take a critical standpoint if one is deeply rooted in one’s own tradition, value system, and social community, since it can be the case that the social practices and convictions are simply biased (Kopelman 1994) or unjust according to an external standpoint (Apartheid in South Africa, the caste system in India). Furthermore, casuistry seems to presuppose a widespread agreement on basic values in the community and, therefore, is doomed to failure in pluralistic cultures (Wildes 1993). Finally, casuistry may have difficulty providing solutions to rather general bioethical regulatory policies since it is completely focused on cases. Whether a series of similar cases may warrant a particular regulatory practice from a casuistical point of view is a matter of debate (see virtue ethics), but it seems fair to say that the very meaning of casuistry really concerns cases and not general rules which can be adopted as binding regulations.
Feminist bioethics can only be fully appreciated if one understands the context in which this increasingly important approach evolved during the late twentieth century (Tong 1993, Wolf 1996, Donchin and Purdy 1999, Rawlinson 2001). The social and political background of feminist bioethics is feminism and feminist theory with its major social and political goal to end the oppression of women and to empower them to become an equal gender. The apparent differences between men and women have often led cultures to treat them in radically different ways, ways that often disadvantage women. Thus women have been allocated to social roles that leave them worse off with respect to benefits enjoyed by men, such as freedom and power. Yet despite their differences in reproductive roles, women and men share many morally relevant characteristics such as rationality and the capacity for suffering, and hence deserve fundamental equality.
In more detail, the most important task in the long struggle regarding the goals of feminism was to combine two distinct features that were both vital in order to fight against traditional power relations. That is, the idea that men and women are equal and different at the same time. They are equal by virtue of gender equality and different because the proponents stress a particular feminist perspective. The combination of both aspects is, in general, a difficult task for feminist ethics since, on the one hand, the proponents must avoid the common trap of speaking in traditional dualistic ways of care versus justice, particularity versus universality, and emotion versus reason and, on the other hand, they must carve out the specific differences of the feminist perspective (Haker 2003). Historically speaking, feminist ethics developed in strong opposition to the traditional male-oriented approaches which genuinely appealed to universal moral rights and principles, such as principlism, deontological approaches and utilitarianism (Gilligan 1982, Gudorf 1994, Lebacqz 1995). Feminist ethics, instead, is construed differently by adhering to a context-sensitive and particularist ethics of care as well as by appealing to core values such as responsibility, relational autonomy, care, compassion, freedom, and equality (Gilligan 1982, Noddings 1984, Jagger 1992). The ethics of care, however, is a necessary but not sufficient depiction of feminist ethics since the latter has, in general, become more refined and sophisticated with its different branches (Tong 1989, Cole and Coultrap-McQuin 1992).
Feminist bioethics developed from the early 1970s on and was initially focused on medical ethics (Holmes and Purdy 1992, Warren 1992, Tong 1997); proponents later extended the areas of interest to issues in the fields of animal and environmental ethics (Plumwood 1986, Warren, 1987, Mies and Shiva 1995, Donovan 2008). Important topics in feminist bioethics are concerned with the correct understanding of autonomy as relational autonomy (Sherwin 1992, 1998, Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000, Donchin 2001), a strong focus on care (Kittay 1999), the claim for an equal and just treatment of women in order to fight against discrimination within healthcare professions and institutions on many different levels (Miles 1991, Tong 2002). In more detail, from a feminist perspective the following bioethical issues are of great importance: abortion, reproductive medicine, justice and care, pre-implantation genetic diagnosis, sex selection, exploitation and abuse of women, female genital circumcision, breast cancer, contraception and HIV, equal access to (and quality of) healthcare and healthcare resources, global bioethics and cultural issues. The main line of reasoning is to make a well informed ethical decision which is not gender biased and to appeal to important core values. Feminist bioethics is by nature particularistic and in this respect it is similar to many virtue ethical approaches and casuistry.
Without any doubt, feminist bioethics initiated discussion of important topics, provided valuable insights, and caused a return to a more meaningful way of ethical reasoning and decision making by, for example, not only adhering to universal moral norms. On the other hand, it can be doubted whether feminist bioethics—all things considered—can be seen as a well-equipped and full moral theory. It may be that feminist bioethics complements the traditional ethical theories by adding an important and new perspective (that is, the feminist standpoint) to the debate. Several vital methodological topics still need to be clarified in more detail and put into a broader moral context—such as how to avoid the traditional dualistic way of speaking about things and at the same time stressing a particular feminist standpoint; the problem of loyalty towards family and close friends and impartiality in ethics (universalism versus particularism); and feminist bioethics and the global perspective. Developing feminist bioethics is on the agenda of many scholars working in the fields of virtue ethics and casuistry. Thus, feminist bioethics comes in for the standard objections raised by the opponents of virtue ethics and casuistry alike. Therefore, it must also defend itself against some of the above-mentioned objections that are not peculiar to feminist bioethics. To sum up, feminist bioethics adds valuable insights to debates on various bioethical topics, but may not be a well-equipped full moral theory yet.
University of Cologne, Germany
Vytautas Magnus University, Lithuania
Last updated: November 4, 2012 | Originally published: