Philosophy of Biology

Philosophy of biology is the branch of philosophy of science that deals with biological knowledge. It can be practiced not only by philosophers, but also by scientists who reflect on their own work. The distinctive mark of philosophy of biology is the effort to achieve generalizations about biology, up to various degrees. For instance, philosophy of biology makes biology relevant to classic issues in philosophy of science such as causation and explanation, chance, progress, history, and reductionism. It also works to characterize how knowledge is acquired and modified in different areas of biology, and sometimes to clarify the criteria that demarcate science from non-science.

Philosophy also performs constructive criticism of biology. For example, it has an important role in analyzing cases of “naturalization”—when science becomes able to study issues that traditionally were the exclusive domain of philosophy. The life sciences and their objects are changing and growing exponentially. A challenge for philosophy of biology is thus to keep the pace, not only with new knowledge modifying long-standing ideas (for example, the “Tree of Life”), but also with new scientific practices and unprecedented kinds of data. Accordingly, philosophy of biology is constantly provoked in shifting its own methods and attention. In some cases, philosophy of biology can aid the life sciences to reach their goals, by means of conceptual analysis, linguistic analysis, and epistemological analysis.

Hybridizations and intersections between scientific fields are particularly conducive to philosophical considerations. Contemporary examples are ‘EvoDevo’ (the recent integration between development and evolution) and ‘cultural evolution’ (an approach to cultural change inspired by evolutionary biology). Theses and analyses of philosophy of biology are often entwined with history of biology and with the history of evolution. Finally, philosophy of biology can elaborate messages and general views out of biology, and has a crucial role in caring for how science is publicly interrogated and communicated.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. General Issues in Philosophy of Biology
    1. General Problems in Philosophy of Science, as Seen in Biology
    2. A General Picture of Biology
    3. A General Picture of Science
    4. Generalization as a Possible Distinctive Feature of Philosophy with Respect to Biology
  3. Philosophy Flanking Biology
    1. Clarifying Taxonomy, Classification, Systematics, Phylogeny, Homology
    2. Formulating Natural Selection
  4. Who Can Do Philosophy of Biology?
    1. Philosophical Biologists
      1. Mayr and Population Thinking
      2. Gould and Adaptationism
    2. Philosophical Issues Naturalized
      1. An Example: The Biology of Morality
      2. Philosophy Versus Naturalization?
  5. Philosophy Bringing the Life Sciences out of Their Research Context
    1. Philosophy of Biology at Intersections
    2. Biology’s Critical Friend
    3. Developing Messages from Biology
  6. Scientifically Up-to-Date Philosophy
    1. Questioning Influential Ideas
    2. Understanding New Scientific Practices
    3. Rethinking the Philosophical Approach from New Ways of Doing Science
  7. History and Philosophy of Biology
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Cited Examples
    2. Classics
      1. First Generation
      2. Second Generation
    3. Contemporary
      1. Reviews
      2. Some Monographs
    4. Anthologies and Textbooks
    5. Journals
      1. Dedicated
      2. Generalist
    6. Organizations
    7. Online Resources

1. Introduction

According to several reconstructions of the history of philosophy of biology, the field emerged gradually in the 1960s with a first generation of self-identified philosophers of biology, especially Morton Beckner, David Lee Hull, Marjorie Grene, Kenneth Schaffner, Michael Ruse, and William C. Wimsatt. As an explanation for such branching of philosophy of science, some philosophers put forth the decline of logical positivism in the 1960s and 1970s. For others, logical positivism did not actually decline, and anyway it had never suppressed philosophy of biology (Callebaut 1993). At times, the ‘official’ chronology gets questioned. For Byron (2007), proper philosophy of biology was already there in early philosophy of science, since the 1930s, as shown by a bibliometrical analysis. The most quoted philosopher in this article is David Lee Hull (1935-2010). He is a noncontroversially important figure in the founding generation of philosophers of biology. His meta-reflective papers “What philosophy of biology is not” (1969) and “Recent philosophy of biology” (2002) are particularly useful.

Philosophy of biology turned into a professional subdiscipline since the mid-1970s, with a ‘second generation’ of philosophers, the most cited being Ronald Amundson, John Beatty, Robert N. Brandon, Richard Burian, Lindley Darden, David J. Depew, John Dupré, James R. Griesemer, Philip Kitcher, Elisabeth A. Lloyd, Alexander Rosenberg, Elliott Sober, and Bruce H. Weber. Some of them were experienced philosophers who progressively shifted to biological issues. The first journal partially devoted to philosophy of biology – History and Philosophy of the Life Sciences – began to be published in 1979, and in the mid-1980s the discipline was fully established. Specialized journals flourished. In the early 2000s, a growing number of scholars, institutions, and journals specialized in philosophy of biology, and the discipline gained more and more room in scientific books, journals, and conferences (see the resources at the end of the article).

As we shall see, philosophy of biology provides accounts of biological knowledge, asking: how are explanation, causation, evidence and other epistemological primitives elaborated in the explanations that are typical of biology, such as natural selection, genetic drift, and homology? Does biology differ from other sciences? How? And how do we understand the epistemological diversity across different branches of the biological sciences? Philosophy of biology also considers whether biology may contribute to redefine classical demarcations   of science from other forms of knowledge and human creation.

Philosophy of biology can be seen as a possible aid for scientific advancement in the life sciences. Contributions of philosophers were widely appreciated by scientists, for example, in the areas of classification, taxonomy, and related activities, and in the abstract formulation of natural selection in the development of biology after Darwin. Scientists themselves may reflect philosophically on their own field of research, justifying and correcting their practices, or denouncing biases and transformations in their own community. Concepts, such as ‘adaptation’ or ‘species,’ are underlain by complex, inferential structures that can be revealed and sometimes criticized by philosophical analysis. Multiple and conflicting meanings may be uncovered and systematized to help the progress of science and to develop more general messages.

Phenomena studied by biology make this science particularly sensible and interesting for philosophy. Humans are organisms, and quite a few fields of biology have potential or direct implications for our self-understanding. Interesting philosophical debates have stemmed, for example, since the 1970s from the provocative proposal of a ‘sociobiological synthesis’; such synthesis claims to provide evolutionary explanations for human prosocial (and anti-social) behaviors that were traditionally covered by ethics. Philosophy overcame mere self-defensive attitudes, and its important role lied in epistemological analysis and in deep reflections on the limits and conditions of naturalization, which may be understood as the transition of a problem into the domain of empirical science. Neurobiology offers a particularly fertile ground for reflections about how human phenomena can be related to, or even explained by, biology. And how should a philosophical field like moral philosophy take biology into account? (For more on the topic of the naturalization of morality, for example, see ethics.)

Philosophy of biology may study and support the interaction among different life sciences, as in the case of evolutionary developmental biology, where workers claim to be reuniting genetics and evolution with embryology, recomposing a historical divide in biology. How do different research traditions integrate or replace each other? This question illuminates classic issues such as progress and scientific change with new light. Philosophy of biology also monitors the natural hybridization of biology with extra-biological fields, such as cultural transmission, and enriches the debate among scientists where extreme positions often pop out: does biology offer more rigorous methods to replace the failing methods of the social sciences? Are we facing, instead, a case of mutual inspiration? Or methodological integration? Which reciprocal prejudices are well-grounded? And how can they be overcome for fruitful scientific collaborations?

Philosophy of biology also has a mandatory critical role towards biology. For example, it can unveil the progressionist, anthropomorphic, and anthropocentric biases that affect scientists as human beings who live immersed in a society and in a cultural environment. Critical attention must be particularly high when scientific classifications of humans (for example, through measures such as IQ or ethnicity) may lead to justify and increase social discrimination, segregation or oppression.

Philosophy of biology may also develop ways of thinking up from biological research, providing an inspiring and readable encompassing view of the living world that will hardly be found in any standard, scientific publication. Furthermore, philosophy of biology is called upon to work on the interface between science and society, contributing to both the common misunderstandings and the best strategies for citizens to become conscious and informed, as they are called to decide what kind of research and intervention will be allowed or actively pursued by society.

It is hard for philosophy of biology to keep pace with the fast development of biological knowledge. But the effort of following the moving frontier of knowledge allows philosophy of biology to study the fall of influential ideas, such as the universal Tree of Life, and the rise of new scientific practices, such as intensive computer modeling. Philosophy also has the unsettling opportunity to constantly rethink its own approach, avoiding drifting too far away from scientific practice so as to become detached. In this dynamic, philosophy of biology is also well integrated with history of science, so that it is often hard to distinguish between the two. An analysis of the relationship between molecular biology and Mendelian genetics, for example, is intertwined with the historical account of the birth and early development of molecular biology in the 1980s. In turn, the philosophical framing of genetics and developmental biology as either ontology-based disciplines or research styles transforms radically the way in which the history of the two fields is told.

Philosophy of biology belongs to philosophy, therefore, no fixed procedure or protocol constrains its research (what is philosophy?). Philosophy of biology consists in free and critical — although rigorous and informed — thought on biological knowledge as the latter develops through time. However, as a mature and recognized field with its own interconnected practicing community, philosophy of biology seems to feature some methodological principles:

  • Philosophy of biology is supposed to be scientifically informed and up-to-date, capturing how recent research modifies established knowledge and creates new scientific practices. In turn, these novelties transform philosophy’s problems and approaches, especially in the current explosive growth of biology.
  • Philosophy and biology are not always clearly distinct. Scientific work can routinely require, for example, conceptual or epistemological On the other hand, philosophy can turn out to be effective in setting up scientific research projects. However, philosophy can be characterized by its leaning towards generalities about biology, namely general philosophical problems, general characterizations of fields and approaches within biology, or conceptualizations of biology as a whole or even of science as a whole.
  • Philosophy of biology should try to be understandable and possibly useful to biologists. Its tools — conceptual analysis, epistemology, traditions of thinking and debates — should be put to use for improving scientific research.
  • Biologists can do philosophy of biology. This happens, for example, when they become interested in general features of biology and try to contribute with principles derived from their work or when they think about the inferential patterns employed by themselves and their colleagues. Also, scientists can do philosophy and speak to philosophy when particular objects of philosophical study, such as human morality, get naturalized (see below).
  • Philosophy of biology cares for working across disciplinary contexts. For example, it studies novel contacts between previously separated fields, develops general views of the living world from some aspect of the life sciences, or reveals complex connections between science and the socio-cultural context in which it is carried out. It also takes advantage of its knowledge for monitoring and assisting how science is publicly communicated and interrogated.
  • Philosophy of biology is increasingly seen as one piece with history of biology, since philosophical and historical theses are mutually necessary, and their results reverberate reciprocally.

These six methodological principles are usually tacit, but sometimes they are made explicit by philosophers of biology, who may also disagree on some of them. The principles will be presented here by means of exemplar studies. Any set of examples is anyhow partial and biased, since philosophy of biology is a huge field full of fascinating topics, growing exponentially along with biology. For a more complete picture, the interested reader will have to navigate the resources listed at the end of the article, such as philosophy of biology journals or programs of conferences such as the biennial meetings of the International Society for the History, Philosophy, and Social Studies of Biology, the main reference society of the field. A number of textbooks in philosophy of biology are available, often in the form of anthologies. A list of all these resources is provided at the end for further reading.

Given the vastness of the philosophy of biology literature, this article can only indicate some of the main topics and the richness of discussions. The examples in this article are mainly focused on evolutionary biology. Evolutionists such as Ernst Mayr (1904-2005) and Stephen Jay Gould (1942-2002), two of the most influential authors, are extensively treated in this article though they are not universally representative. The predominance of evolution can be justified not only by the author’s specialization, but also by the fact that—as many philosophers of biology have critically stressed in recent times—evolutionary theory has long been the main target of philosophy of biology. Only in the last few decades has this situation changed radically (Müller-Wille 2007, Pradeu 2009). Philosophy of biology is already tackling an enormous range of topics in the most disparate fields, from biomedicine to community ecology, from neurobiology to microbiology and microbial ecology, and from chemistry and biochemistry to exobiology. To look for some specific area, the interested reader is, once again, encouraged to venture into the journals and online resources.

2. General Issues in Philosophy of Biology

Philosophers of science (though not always under this fairly recent name) have reflected for centuries on explanation, causation, correlation, chance, and many other general topics concerning science or knowledge in general. Important philosophers contributed to concepts like reduction vs. multiple realizability, and provided theories of explanation that describe what a scientific explanation is. During the second half of the 20th century, philosophy of science adopted a pluralistic strategy, considering the diversity of scientific disciplines and methods and striving to understand their differences along with their common aspects. With this pluralization, the complex task remained of finding a satisfying description of science as an endeavor which—unitary or not—is distinct from other forms of knowledge.

The study of living beings offers a universe of occasions for philosophy of science to advance the reflection. For instance, explanations by natural selection and by drift (see below, 2.a) can be seen as instances of causal explanations that nonetheless bring about new reflections and conceptual puzzles on the classic issues of causation, randomness, and ontology of processes. Homology explanations, another typical feature of biology, explain the properties or the variability of a biological character by citing the ancestral character or organ, and the causal factors that historically modify the descendants of that ancestral organ. In trying to account for biological sciences, philosophy of biology may take concepts from philosophy of science, such as causal explanation or reduction, and find new putative cases of them in the life sciences or locate failures of reduction in biology. Other times, philosophy of biology may need to tailor new concepts to accommodate biology. In fact, some kinds of explanation seem peculiar to biology or to historical sciences. While chasing the peculiarities of biology, philosophy of biology also has some general research goals among its aims:

  1. Often, philosophy of biology scours biology in search of new insights on general philosophical problems about science, such as the “problem of induction,” or the realism vs. instrumentalism dichotomy. Additionally, new general problems arise from the particular forms that explanation, causation, or reduction take in biology.
  2. Sometimes philosophy of biology seeks general characterizations of particular fields, practices, or ways of thinking within the life sciences Other times, the goal seems to be a general picture of biology, especially by contrast to other sciences, such as classical mechanics.

Sometimes philosophy of biology suggests general views of science, descriptions and characterizations of science with all the complexity, differentiation, and plurality that it exhibits in the contemporary world. In fact, the classical task of a demarcation of true science from other forms of knowledge has lost importance under the effect of philosophy of ‘special’ sciences like biology (Fodor 1974).

a. General Problems in Philosophy of Science, as Seen in Biology

Natural selection is a major biological explanation for the features of organisms. Inherited traits, originated by cumulative retention of random variation, are there because of the positive contribution they have brought to their bearers in past generations, in terms of survival and reproduction. Yet, the explanatory structure of natural selection is very complex, and implies a reflection on concepts like causality and randomness. In a classic book, Sober (1984) pointed out that only a few of the traits that get selected are in fact explanatory, specifically those traits that are selected for. Other traits are free riders that are somehow correlated with traits that are selected for and thus are preserved in the population without actively contributing to fitness. Thus, there is selection of such free rider traits that are not causally relevant to survival and reproduction. Hearts are positively selected; heartthrob is also selected, but not selected for; efficiency in pumping blood is selected for; the existence of heartthrob is thus explained by natural selection, but heartthrob is not explanatory per se; it undergoes selection of, not selection for. The idea of free riders on selection was already considered by Darwin, but philosophers of biology spelled out its consequences for the explanatory structure of natural selection. Causal relationships are the core of some theories of explanation. Sober proposed rethinking the idea of causality in light of evolutionary biology, and this is an example of how classic philosophical categories can be modified in their application to biology: “We must show that by considering evolutionary theory, old problems can be transformed and new problems brought into being. It remains to be seen, I think, how radically the philosophy of science will be reinterpreted” (Sober 1984: 7; see Matthen and Ariew 2009, Ramsey 2013).

Randomness and chance are very important in biology. Natural selection is not random: “it requires randomness as its ‘input’...but the ‘output’ of natural selection is decidedly nonrandom, the differential survival and reproduction of the variants that are better adapted” (Rosenberg and McShea 2008: 21). Philosophers worked, for example, on the meaning of “random mutation,” a concept considered essential to Darwinism as opposed to Lamarckism (Merlin 2010). Random does not necessarily mean lacking deterministic causes. Rather, random mutation points to the fact that the usefulness of a trait in the environment where it appears is not among the causes of its appearance. The source of variation is thus more properly contingent with respect to fitness. An interesting line of reasoning and evidence points out that “evolutionary divergence is sometimes due to differences in the order of appearance of chance variations, and not to differences in the direction of selection” (Beatty 2010: 39).

Genetic drift is the predictable change of the frequencies of traits that are not under selection. The absence of selection makes the dynamic depend only on the reproduction mechanism, and although the fate of individual traits is not predictable, the overall landscape of frequencies is. Genetic drift has long been known in formal models, studied in the field, and used for evolutionary reconstruction: it is not only necessary, but also causally relevant to evolution. Yet, a lively philosophical debate exists on the ontology of drift and selection (Millstein 2002; Walsh et al. 2002). A major disagreement concerns the epistemic status of mathematical models: granted that drift is a necessary feature of mathematical models, what can be legitimately inferred about the existence of a process in the world to be called drift? A statistical interpretation sees both drift and selection as mathematical features of aggregates of individuals (Walsh 2007, Matthen 2009, 2010). Another point of view considers them as causal physical processes (Millstein 2006, Millstein and Skipper 2009). The notion of evidence as a way of choosing between alternative explanatory hypotheses, selection versus drift, for example, is another object of philosophical study. Some philosophers think scientists are more qualified to evaluate and weigh evidence (Hull 1969: 169). Others point out that it is up to philosophy to probe the explanatory limits—current and constitutional—of biology (Rosenberg and McShea 2008: 2). One fortunate approach to such a task is the technical account of evidence based on Bayesianism (Sober 2008). Bayes’ theorem belongs to the mathematics of probability theory. It is based on prior probability, the probability of a particular statement before the observation, and posterior probability, the probability of the statement in the light of the observation. Bayes’ theorem is used by some schools of philosophers of biology in explicating various issues connected with evidence and confirmation.

Homology explanations explain the properties or the variability of a biological character,  the form of a wing or the range of different wing shapes across different groups of organisms, for example, by citing the ancestral character or organ, and the modification factors that affect the descendants of that ancestral organ. Like many modes of explanation in biology, homology explanations are historical (see also 3.a). Philosopher Ereshefsky (2012) compares homology explanations with analogy explanations, which instead explain a character by citing the contribution of that character to a function. Ereshefsky points out that homology explanations are more detailed and offer a better account of observed differences. Homology explanations can be also turned into strong historical explanations, as opposed to weak ones that only cite the ancestral, initial condition. This happens, for example, when detailed molecular studies of the development of the target character enlighten precise events, such as gene duplications, that must have been crucial along the historical path. The study of genetic and developmental pathways also gives access to hierarchical disconnect which, for Ereshefsky, relates homology explanations to classical topics of philosophy of science: multiple realizability and reductionism. Hierarchical disconnect happens when “a homologue at one level of biological organization is caused by non-homologous developmental factors at lower levels of organization” (p. 385). Along the historical path, for example, a morphological structure can remain stable while its underlying developmental modules change (Griffiths and Brigandt 2007). For Ereshefsky, this is a biological example of multiple realizability, that is the fact that one level of organization cannot be reduced to a kind at a lower level. This in turn, for Ereshefsky, counters ideas by Alex Rosenberg about reductionism in biology (Rosenberg 2006). For Rosenberg—Ereshefsky says—the history of homologous characters should be reducible to the history of their physical substrata, but Ereshefsky says hierarchical disconnect shows decoupled histories and multiple realizability.

b. A General Picture of Biology

In characterizing ways of thinking and kinds of explanations and evidence, philosophy of biology formulates generalizations about biology. These generalizations become particularly encompassing when philosophy of biology tries to characterize biology explicitly and comprehensively as distinct from other sciences. Biology is generally considered a ‘special science’—a term inherited from logical positivist philosophy of science that doesn’t preclude, in the long run, a reduction to physics (Fodor 1974, Rosenberg and McShea 2008). Among the most noticed and studied features of biology there is the apparent absence of scientific laws, whose blueprint, so to speak, are physical laws (but see Waters 1998). Many have been the endeavors of describing biology as a science without relying on laws, but also without relegating it as a mere collection and description of singular events where exceptions are the law.

For Ernst Mayr (1982, 2004), biology is based on concepts or principles, which are more flexible than laws: biology is a unique science by virtue of concepts that allow for biological explanation, including inheritance, program, population, variation, emergence, organism, individual, species, selection, fitness, and so on. Biology is also characterized by population thinking, introduced by Darwin, which differentiates biology from mechanics or chemistry whose thinking is, for Mayr, essentialist or typological (for more on this see 4.a.i).

For paleontologist Niles Eldredge biology is based on patterns. Patterns are law-like regularities, consisting of repeated schemes of events. This notion characterizes biology as a historical science, while reducing the gap that, in other views, separates biology from other natural sciences like physics. The pattern of inclusive hierarchical similarity in the biological world was seen by Linnaeus and captured in his binomial nomenclature. Darwin saw more patterns, for example in the geographical distribution of species and varieties. He then discovered a subset of the grand complex of repeated events, or regular processes, that give rise to biodiversity on Earth—the pattern of evolution. Mendel caught some patterns as well, in his observations of inheritance. Patterns have a double nature, ontological and epistemological: “Patterns in the natural world are extremely important.… They pose both the questions and the answers that scientists formulate as they seek to describe the world…. Science is a search for resonance between mind and natural pattern as we try to answer these questions” (Eldredge 1999: 4-5).

Other scholars think of biology as a science of mechanisms. A growing philosophical movement called “the New Mechanism” (Machamer et al. 2000) use the concept to revise classic ideas like causation, discovery, and explanation. In this view, biologists aim to discover and represent mechanisms with their schemas, sketches, and theoretical models. The characterization of natural selection as a mechanism, for instance, has been proposed, but is yet to be resolved (Skipper and Millstein 2005).

Model-based accounts have acquired particular importance in philosophy of biology (Schaffner 1993, 1998). The semantic view of scientific theories in the 1980s (see 2.c) was a first ambitious endeavor to characterize biology as a model-based science. Downes (1992) pointed out the limits of the semantic view in its original formulation, but proposed that philosophers of biology keep some of its central claims, among which are the centrality of various kinds of models in biology and their promise of accounting for all scientific theorizing.

At a lower degree of generality, philosophy of biology offers a proliferation of ideas about how schools of scientists, fields, or approaches perform fundamental activities of science like explaining, describing, understanding, or predicting. Some included the aforementioned and conceptually challenging explanations like natural selection, drift and historical homology explanations. Others include the practices of ecological modeling and model organisms, (6.b) particular inferential patterns such as adaptationism (4.a.ii), and the difference between geneticists and developmental biologists (7). These are all typicalities, or modest generalizations, of sub-parts of biology. Population genetics is a thoroughly studied field from this point of view. By studying population genetics, philosophers have raised wide-ranging topics of reflection, such as the degree of idealization of models and experiments (Plutynski 2005, Morrison 2006). The concept of the possible has played a role in accounting for how biological idealizations can be explanatory: if biological models cannot predict or demonstrate necessity, they can at least restrict the field of what is possible, yielding so-called “how possibly” answers or explanations. For Rosenberg and McShea (2008) it is a “usual scientific” strategy that “scientists try to characterize a range of possible causes of evolution, and then to determine which of these possibilities actually obtained. The actual is first understood by first embedding it in the possible” (p. 13).

Even the tightest case studies usually produce generalizations to a certain degree. Grote and O’Malley (2011), for example, claim that their historical reconstruction of research on microbial rhodopsins

offers a novel perspective on the history of the molecular life sciences…, sheds light on the dynamic connections between basic and applied science, and hypothesis-driven and data-driven approaches [and] provides a rich example of how science works over longer time periods, especially with regard to the transfer of materials, methods and concepts between different research fields. (Grote and O’Malley 2011, p. 1082)

Sometimes generalizations come in negative form. Case studies are counted as evidence that science may not have features that are commonly thought as necessary requirements. Grote and O’Malley (cit.) propose their case against those philosophical descriptions that interpret scientific advancement in terms of general, overarching, and unifying theories. They observe that “productive interactions between different fields of science occur not only through the adaptation of theories, concepts, or models, but very much at the level of materials or experimental systems” (p. 1094, emphasis added).

c. A General Picture of Science

What is science in and of itself? How does it differ from other forms of knowledge? These two sides of the coin were a major motivating question for philosophy of science since its very beginning. Philosophers of biology sometimes take the methodological lessons they learn from biology and tentatively postulate their broader applicability to science (see Griesemer in section 7). However, a general view of science is often far from the explicit goals of philosophy of biology. There are historical reasons for this. In a paper on general philosophy of science, Psillos (2012) traces the problem back to Aristotle, through landmark thinkers like Immanuel Kant and Pierre Duhem, to the Modern era. The problem of demarcation was surely central in logical empiricism, but in the 1970s the idea was spread that “individual sciences are not similar enough to be lumped together under the mould of a grand unified scheme of how science works” (Psillos, cit.: 100). After 1950s—and certainly in the early 1980s, when philosophy of biology became an academic field—there was a consensus on the basic fact that science employs a variety of methods. Indeed, biology, together with other sciences like the human and the social sciences, had shaken the Modern idea of the scientific method.

Nevertheless, some important works have been moved by the need of finding new descriptions of science that would fit biology better than received ones, in order to legitimately include biology among the natural sciences. Political and intellectual movements, such as Intelligent Design, contribute to urging philosophy of biology to tackle the demarcation of science: their strategy includes casting doubts on the scientific status of official biological sciences and presenting alternative, religiously inspired views as scientific theories (Sober 2007, Boudry et al. 2010). The creationist movement is present in the philosophers’ mental map worldwide since at least 1981, when philosopher of biology Michael Ruse was a key witness for the plaintiff in the trial McLean vs. Arkansas, a challenge to the state law permitting the teaching of creation science in the Arkansas school system. The federal judge ruled that the state law was unconstitutional. A significant part of the written opinion (see was devoted to philosophical considerations on the epistemological characteristics of science (Claramonte Sanz 2011). Intelligent Design is a new form of scientific creationism, characterized by the wedge strategy, or public insistence on supposed flaws in the established biological sciences combined with supposed scientific demonstrations of an Intelligent Designer of the Universe. While there are different positions about whether philosophers and scientists should directly appear in public debates with creationists, Intelligent Design undoubtedly engages philosophers of biology in reflecting upon possible distinctions within science (between hypotheses, theories, and models, for example), between science and pseudo-science, and between science and religious beliefs. With their competence, philosophers can help scientists in what sociologist Thomas F. Gieryn termed “boundary work” (1999). The need of working on demarcation can also stimulate critical revisions of the patterns of scientific explanation in biology. In a book on evidence, Elliott Sober (2008) stated in a provocatively:

If the only thing that evolutionary biologists do is go around saying ‘that’s due to natural selection’ when they examine the complex and useful traits that organisms have, they are engaged in the same sterile game that creationists play when they declare ‘that’s due to intelligent design’. Assumptions about natural selection of course can be invented that allow the hypothesis of natural selection to fit what we observe. But that is not good enough: the question is whether there is independent evidence for those auxiliary propositions. (Sober 2008, p. 189)

The semantic view of scientific theories is an example of a general account of science that was put to work in justifying evolutionary biology as a model-based science, in face of the inveterate poor fit of the received view based on syntactic theories and universal laws (Lloyd 1983, 1984, 1988). Under the semantic view, models constitute the core of scientific work; theories are to be seen as combinations of families of models plus hypotheses about the empirical scope of those models. This framework contrasts with the received view which described theories as sets of sentences—including laws—about the world. In the semantic view, laws are conceived in a new way: from universal empirical claims about the world, they become specifications of models, embedded in them. An important argument for philosophers of biology in the 1980s was that the semantic view was not developed ad hoc for evolutionary theory: it had already been successful in describing Newtonian mechanics, equilibrium thermodynamics, and quantum mechanics. However, it was also said, these sciences fitted the received view as well. The semantic view was very demanding in terms of formalization, so it worked only for a very limited area of biology Not all scientific work consists in model building, so the semantic view is hardly considered an exhaustive view of science, and things work so differently for different kinds of models (for example, mathematical vs. non-mathematical) that the existence of a unitary view was questioned (Downes 1992). But new versions of the semantic view continue to be the topic of papers and debates in philosophy of biology.

d. Generalization as a Possible Distinctive Feature of Philosophy with Respect to Biology

As we have seen, philosophy of biology formulates various degrees of generalizations about biology. These generalizations may concern biology as a whole or some subfield of biology. Even in close-distance case studies, where generalization seems far from the goals, it can be shown that generalizations are made (2.b). Philosophy is a generalizing activity. This feature of philosophy may be a way to approach a tricky issue, namely the distinction between biology and philosophy of biology.

Intuitively, philosophy is different from science. The methods of philosophy are based, for example, on logical differences and implications (Hull 1969: 162) or on thought experiments (Rosenberg and McShea 2008: 6), while the methods of science are based on empirical phenomena. But this distinction is not as clear-cut as it might seem. Scientists also use thought experiments. Einstein famously used them for developing both special relativity and general relativity, and Darwin worked intensely with thought experiments—to mention only two representative cases. Conceptual, foundational, and linguistic analyses are an integral part of scientific research too. This means that scientists autonomously do philosophy in their day-to-day work. Indeed, professional biologists, as thinkers, could and should shift from their own main activity to more philosophical ones whenever needed. The other way around, philosophers of biology usually want to contribute to the advancement of science. In a sense, they want to be part of science. Furthermore, the methods of philosophy are constantly evolving, stimulated by advancements in biology, so that it is not rare now to find philosophical studies that include mathematical analysis, computer simulations, or even empirical research. The science-philosophy distinction is thus very blurred. Given this situation, is there any possible demarcation between philosophy and biology?

David Hull (2002) characterized philosophy of biology as meta-science:

Knowing some science can be of great assistance to philosophers of science, but philosophers of science as philosophers of science do not do science.... For example, the equation F = ma is part of science, in particular physics. The claim that F = ma is a law of nature is part of the domain of philosophy of science. To the extent that science and philosophy can be distinguished in practice, scientists tell us what the world is like, and philosophers of science tell us what science is like. (Hull 2002, p. 117)

One interpretation of philosophy of science as meta-science, which seems faithful to Hull’s idea, is that philosophy of biology seeks generalizations about biology.

The idea of philosophy of biology as generalization about biology has descriptive advantages, but it would be contested by some philosophers. In fact, no idea in the literature about the specificity of philosophy remains uncontroversial. When it comes to ambiguous science-philosophy cases, philosophers debate the right way of doing philosophy. They are much clearer in saying what it means to be a scientist than they are in saying what it means to be a philosopher.

In a view of philosophy as meta-science, the mark of philosophy is the leaning towards generalizations about science. This is not a yes/no requirement; it comes in degrees. Sometimes, for instance, works in biology make generalizations about biology (see Mayr and Gould’s examples below). These works sometimes become philosophical while other times they remain scientific because they generalize only to a degree which is functional to the scientific activity. This continuity accounts for the demarcation uncertainties that are going to persist in the field.

3. Philosophy Flanking Biology

 As is demonstrated in other parts of this article, philosophy can take a theme and develop it with great autonomy from science or adopt a critical focus on science and on the complex relationship between science and society. According to many authors, however, there is also potential for philosophy to actively and directly contribute to the advancement of life sciences. While it is commonly accepted that biologists can undertake philosophy of biology, it is more controversial whether philosophers can do biology in a proper sense. But biologists have generally been a receptive community. In 2002, David Hull had written:

Philosophers are attempting to join with biologists to improve our understanding of…biological phenomena. As such, they run the risk of being considered by biologists to be ‘intruders’. In point of fact, biologists have been amazingly receptive to philosophers who have turned their hand to philosophy of biology with a significant emphasis on “biology.” (Hull 2002: 124)

When philosophers are close to scientific practice and current problems, they see how they can help science in advancing towards its aims, either by criticizing existing ideas and practices or by proposing revised ones. In Hull’s line of thought, philosophers are encouraged to devote time and effort to work with biologists, or to formulate problems in ways that are interesting and understandable to biologists. Philosophical treatments that are too extensive, stereotypical, or posed in a way that is not relevant to biologists, or those with an excess of philosophical formalization that prevents access to scientists, should be avoided: “Formalization may be an excellent way of working out problems in the philosophy of science. It is not a very good way of communicating the results” (Hull 1969: 178).

Philosophers try to help biologists to better frame their questions, for example by “uncovering presuppositions and making them explicit” (Sober 1984), by analyzing conceptual foundations (Pigliucci and Kaplan 2006), or by pursuing the detection, analysis, and sometimes solution of theoretical and methodological problems. A great deal of the philosophy of biology consists in working on scientific language to clarify the meaning of concepts such as life, purpose, progress, complexity, genetic program, adaptation, and so on (Rosenberg and McShea 2008: 4). Since these concepts frame the scientific questions, philosophy of biology can “clarify, broaden or narrow the domain of theories, uncovering ‘pseudo-questions’” (Rosenberg and McShea, cit.: 6). Critical analysis and conceptual clarification are particularly valued tasks, and conceptual clarity is seen as a necessary virtue of philosophy of biology. One mode of work consists in looking, together with biologists, at concepts or mathematical models and their interpretations. This line of work is exemplified hereafter (3.a, 3.b): two traditional areas where philosophy has contributed by casting some light are the connections among biological enterprises like taxonomy, classification, and systematics (3.a), and the abstract descriptions of natural selection (3.b).

a. Clarifying Taxonomy, Classification, Systematics, Phylogeny, Homology

In biology, taxonomy consists in the recognition of natural groups, that is the taxa (singular: taxon). Classification deals with the categories and ranks to be assigned to taxa (for example, species, genus, family). Systematics is, by definition, a systematic study of the living world in search for order, or, in other words, the search for the relationships among taxa. And phylogeny is the reconstruction of the temporal scheme of common descent and relatedness among taxa. In fact, despite these gross characterizations, the four activities are intertwined and depend on each other. Their distinctions, definitions, and relationships are a traditional matter of reflection for philosophy of biology (Wilkins and Ebach 2011).

In the 1960s, philosophers, perhaps thanks to the heritage of the Western philosophical tradition, proved to be particularly ready and equipped for helping scientists understand their own various ways of finding order in the living world. According to Hull (1969), one of the important early contributions of philosophy of biology to logical clarity was the taxon-category distinction, the distinction between “individuals, classes, and classes of classes” (p. 171). Philosophers were able to contribute, for Hull, once they accepted to arrange their formalisms to communicate with biologists. Hull himself (1976) long argued for species having the ontological status of evolutionary individuals unlike taxa in other categories. Hull relied on the Biological Species Concept (BSC) that defines species as reproductive communities. In accordance with the BSC, whereas a taxon is determined by a set of shared characteristics, the species-rank of the taxon—its membership in the species category—is determined by actual evolutionary relationships, in particular by interbreeding habits. With a similar line of reasoning, Hull defended the idea of species as historical individuals, as opposed to classes or types. Species, perhaps, are leaving the limelight of philosophical reflection as a consequence of the body of discoveries about the fluidity of their boundaries, the heterogeneity of their phenomenology, and the rarity of canonic biological species across the biological world. But the debate on individuality was complex and lively, and is still partly open today (Wilkins 2011).

In early years, philosophy of biology demonstrated its value also by analyzing the entanglement among biological hypotheses—explicit and implicit—in different domains. For example, philosophers refuted the idea of taxonomy as a theory-free activity, prior to functional attributions and to evolutionary hypotheses. Character recognition does bring into play theoretical considerations: the definition of “kidney,” for instance, presupposes physiological knowledge of kidney function, and/or hypotheses on the evolutionary derivation of kidneys. The acceptance of evolutionary theory in all fields of biology, completed during the first half of the 20th century, triggered hot debates on its relevance to taxonomy, systematics, and classification (Hull 1970): does taxonomy have to reflect evolution? And in what sense? Could adaptation by natural selection be a criterion for systematics, or is pure common descent the candidate? Philosophers took part in trying to clarify these issues.

The network of assumptions and hypotheses of biology is an enduring object of study for philosophy. There is a certain consensus on the fact that phylogeny should constrain systematics; that is, systematics should reflect phylogeny as much as possible. Many authors even equate the two tasks altogether: “Practitioners of systematics study the historical pattern of evolution among groups of living things, i.e., phylogeny” (Haber 2008). Yet, taxonomy, classification, systematics, and phylogeny are unequally performed by different professionals upon significantly uneven living and fossil taxa, and there are many conflicting needs and goals. Species concepts in paleontology are by force very different from those that fit neontology (Wilkins 2011), an issue that yields differently organized classifications (Wilkins & Ebach 2013). Even among biologists who study currently living organisms, the ideas on how to integrate taxonomy and classification with systematics and phylogeny vary much across specialists at all degrees of specialization—for example,entomologists, botanists, and mammalogists. Furthermore, a classification of domestic animals or plants is likely to incorporate much morphological, physiological, and ecological information beyond phylogenetic relationships if it is to be of any practical use to the knowledge communities that are involved in rearing. And when it comes to decide what information is relevant to identify endangered species (or other units) that should be the object of conservation biology, different ideas —and ethical stances are on the table (Casetta and Marques da Silva 2015).

Philosophy of biology can make or support concrete proposals about how to integrate and refine the various ways of ordering the living world. Philosopher Marc Ereshefsky (1997), for example, has been arguing for systems of nomenclature that are alternative to the Linnean hierarchy (species-genera-Orders etc.). The reason for this position is that all scientific changes that have been happening after Linnaeus’ century—Darwinism, neo-Darwinism, cladistics and new methods in systematics—have turned the hierarchy into an obstacle rather than an aid to taxonomical work.

A specific challenge for philosophy of biology isphylogenetic trees, which are ever revisable hypotheses corroborated to varying degrees. Epistemological and methodological discussions concern the ways of building, interpreting, testing, and revising trees, as well as of relating them to other domains of knowledge such as taxonomy or adaptation. “So what can biologists meaningfully say about phylogeny?” philosopher Matt Haber asks (2008).

Broadly, two different issues have been at the center of recent systematics debates: given epistemic limitations, whether any inference of phylogeny may justifiably be drawn; and given an affirmative answer, what methods ought biologists use to justifiably infer phylogenies, and what are the limits of these inferences? (Haber 2008, p. 231)

Competing and sometimes conflicting methods have been developed to make phylogenetic inference more exact, manageable, or informative. In this domain, methodological differences raised heated conflicts among scientists. The parsimony principle was questioned in its legitimacy and importance. The principle states that the most economic hypothesis has to be more true (Sober 1988). More generally, trees have been examined for their theory-ladenness, that is, their sensitivity to background theoretical assumptions. Other contentious matters were the acceptability of different kinds of data ( genetic vs. morphological, for example), and the limits of the domain of phylogenetic inference. Some workers maintain that methods in phylogenetics should be able to detect homologies (see also 2.a) with certainty, discerning them from analogies. Many others argue under different conceptions that homology detection should rely on large amounts of data, mathematical models of evolution, and probability. Supporters of cladistics reject probability and likelihood for being an unstable ground on which to draw evolutionary trees. They put more confidence in the cladist practictioner’s ability to recognize derivation between characters (Hull 1970, Haber 2008). Meanwhile, the great majority of phylogenetic trees are built by relying on huge sets of genetic sequences and a few morphological characters by means of more and more cost-effective computer programs (this is an example of novel computer-based scientific techniques posing new philosophical problems, see more below). “Total evidence” methods (Sober 2008) address the challenge of building phylogenetic trees by integrating all the available evidence—morphological, geological, ecological, and fossil.

The question of homology is a last example of philosophical enquiry into entangled theoretical backgrounds and hypotheses: “when are two instances of a character to be considered instances of the same character and in what sense?” (Hull 1969: 174). Griffiths and Brigandt (2007) recognize different concepts of homology. The taxic approach to homology—the best known in systematics and philosophy—uses points of resemblances between organisms (shared character states) to diagnose their evolutionary relationships. The transformational approach focuses on the different states in which the same character can exist and be transformed by evolution. A third approach to homology has emerged in conjunction with findings of evolutionary developmental biology (EvoDevo): homology at the phenotypic level is potentially decoupled from homology of developmental processes and homology at the level of the genome (a phenomenon called hierarchical disconnect, see also 2.a). The level of depth thus becomes a necessary specification for homology. Griffiths and Brigandt (cit.) see the different concepts of homology as not only compatible but strongly complementary, and trigger a series of reflections on their relationships.

b. Formulating Natural Selection

Charles Darwin (1859) conceived natural selection as the mechanism of change, splitting, and divergence of lineages. Natural selection is thus the most essential notion of evolutionary theory. Darwin’s formulation of natural selection, substantiated by many empirical studies, was essentially verbal. After Darwin, definitions of natural selection underwent diversification as well as progressive refinement. Mathematical models of natural selection, created in the 20th century, made the process more precise, as population genetics introduced technical terms such as fitness and selection pressures (Haldane 1924), and established different formulas to quantify natural selection and to measure its intensity and effects. But population genetics and mathematics didn’t exhaust the task of formulating natural selection in a theoretical and general way, and philosophers of biology eventually became very actively involved. A classical abstraction of natural selection was elaborated by Richard Lewontin (1970). It was based on variation, fitness, and heritability. Today philosophers acknowledge the value of that account, but they also criticize it as, at once, too simple and too demanding (Godfrey-Smith 2009), ascribing it to a category of recipe descriptions that list the supposedly few and simple ingredients of natural selection. David Hull and Richard Dawkins, for example, independently introduced the original distinction between replicator and interactor, or vehicle. A replicator is anything that passes its structure on largely intact, while an interactor is a cohesive unit whose action in the environment makes a difference in the replication of the replicators it carries. Richard Dawkins (1976), interpreting the work of William Hamilton and George C. Williams (1966), famously took the basic idea of kin selection and developed it into the gene’s eye view, a general view of evolution where selection in the long run is seen as operating basically on genes and organisms are seen as their vehicles. Kin selection (Maynard-Smith 1964) is based on shared inheritance among relatives. Social donor traits are expected to spread in the population if they increase the fitness of the donor’s close relatives, which are likely bearers of the same traits. Inclusive fitness (Hamilton 1963, 1964) is the fitness of a trait deriving from the bearer’s survival and reproduction plus survival and reproduction of relatives (proportionally to the amount of genetic sharing). Dawkins’s “selfish gene” metaphor, based on these mathematical findings, was welcomed by many biologists as a clarifying device in their day-to-day work.  Its effects in the public perception of science are a different story that will be addressed later in the article. Some philosophers of biology got involved in the metaphor, either to develop it (for example, Dennett 1995) or, more often, to criticize it (see Oyama 1998). Several philosophers tried to find other ways of characterizing natural selection. We have already mentioned Sober’s (1984) work on this problem (2.a). Sober (1983) also described evolutionary theory as a theory of forces and population genetics as a theory of “equilibrium models.” Abstract accounts of natural selection and its enabling conditions flourished again with the turn of the 21st century. For Okasha (2006), a replicators-interactors account is too demanding and narrow, imposing unnecessary requirements for natural selection to occur. For Godfrey-Smith (2009), the concept of a population is the crucial one: some features of a population render it “paradigmatically Darwinian”, making natural selection happen. One motivating idea of such descriptions is their potential use for evaluating the operation of natural selection among units at different levels and in different domains (Rosenberg and McShea 2008). We will see below the example of the domain of culture: what kind of selection, if any, is plausible in the cultural domain?

Darwin thought natural selection happened chiefly among individuals: the individual organism was the unit of selection. But late Darwin introduced “group selection” for explaining some traits of humans and social insects (Darwin 1971). Groups were foreshadowed as a larger unit of selection, and group selection seemed to be the explanation for traits that jeopardize individual interest, such as cooperation and abnegation. In the 1960s, evolutionary modeling showed that group selection required repeated isolation, mixture, and re-isolation, namely conditions too narrow to be found in nature with any significant frequency (Maynard-Smith 1964). Group selection was disavowed; traits would not evolve simply because they are good for a group, they have to be selectively advantageous in inter-individual competition from their inception. In the 1970s, some philosophers of biology participated in a movement along with evolutionary biologists and social scientists to try and develop group selection into a scientifically respectable concept (Wilson 1975). In the meantime, kin selection had emerged as a potential alternative explanation for group-beneficial, unselfish traits, leading many scientists to conclude that group selection may be apparent and re-described as kin selection if group members are relatives. Philosophers got directly involved in the debate, sometimes working directly with biologists. In 1984, Elliott Sober, citing Williams (1966) among others, talked about the “mirage” of group fitness, seen as a mere statistical summation of individual fitnesses: “Selection works for the good of the organism; a consequence may be that some groups are better than others. However, it does not follow that selection works for the good of the group” (Sober 1984: 2). In many cases, the individual-based hypothesis is simpler than the group-level characterization, so the principle of parsimony would recommend not adding explanatory mechanisms. However, more in general, “Group, kin, and individual selection need to be disentangled, their difference made clear” (Sober 1984: 4). In fact, conceptual difficulties and fallacies in the units of selection framework were the attractor for philosophers to this debate. Sober changed his mind about group selection through a more careful conceptual analysis and by joining the work of biologist D.S. Wilson (Sober and Wilson 1998). Most philosophers now think that unselfish traits may be explained or made plausible by some combination of trait-level selection, organismal selection, and group selection in a weak sense, together with a multiplication of hierarchies of evolutionary entities and an “extended taxonomy of fitness” that contemplates co-opted by-products and functional shifts (Pievani 2011).

Beyond gene, individual, and group selection, some authors have also attempted to recognize higher levels, such as family selection, species selection, and clade selection, although authoritative biologists such as Ernst Mayr contested this idea: “in no case are these entities as such the object of selection. Selection in these cases always takes place at the level of individuals” (Mayr 1997). Today, for many biologists, the question of what unit is the “true” fundamental unit of selection has been satisfactorily settled—there are several—but there are now new theoretical and empirical questions. Given that multiple levels of vehicles exist, how does natural selection affect selection at lower or higher levels, and how are higher-level vehicles created by lower-level selection (Keller 1999)? The explanatory scope of multi-level selection, as philosophers have often emphasized, is challenged by the major evolutionary transitions in the history of life (Maynard Smith and Szathmáry 1995). Philosophers tend to describe a major transition in evolution as a phase of emergence of a new level—with new units—of selection. The new level contrasts or suppresses selection at the lower level, a process baptized “de-Darwinization” by Godfrey-Smith (2009).

4. Who Can Do Philosophy of Biology?

As David Hull observed in 2002, philosophers “are attempting to join with biologists to improve our understanding of…biological phenomena” (p. 124). As we have seen (2.d), a demarcation between the two profiles—the philosopher and the biologist—is possible but labile, and the distinction is perfectly compatible with any one scholar doing both, even simultaneously (cf. Pradeu 2009). Consider now how Hull’s quote goes on: “But sometimes the tables are turned. Biologists take up traditional philosophical topics and attempt to treat them even if they are not professional philosophers” (Ibidem). Biologists can turn to philosophy in two different ways: by reflecting philosophically on their own work or by naturalizing philosophical problems. In the first case, biologists get interested in issues of epistemology or methodology, and, from the ground of their work, they extrapolate ways of thinking or modes of inference. Naturalization happens when science becomes capable to say something significant and constraining about a traditional topic of philosophy, exemplified here by the origin of morality.

a. Philosophical Biologists

It is not infrequent that biologists undertake philosophical reflections on their own work. This is eased by the fact that some tasks of philosophy, such as conceptual analysis or linguistic clarification, are integral parts of scientific work (see also 2.d). Indeed, one might say that biologists, being experts about their own theories, are sometimes more qualified than philosophers to reflect on their own work. But what about the tendency to generality that characterizes philosophy of biology (section2)? Well, the generalizing route, too, can be followed by working scientists. A biologist’s philosophical effort may certainly vary in depth, richness, reach, and influence, depending on many factors such as the range of his or her interests in terms of both philosophical background and aims. With a good philosophical background, a biologist can match more effectively with debates in philosophical areas. Their aims may go beyond strict functionality for their own research and reach a genuine desire for capturing, defending, or criticizing something deep about their own science. Two examples—among many others—of very influential, philosophically-oriented biologists are ornithologist Ernst Mayr and paleontologist Stephen Jay Gould.

i. Mayr and Population Thinking

Ernst Mayr (1904-2005) was one of the greatest evolutionary biologists of the20th century, but he also increasingly worked in the history and philosophy of biology. He was “a crucial link between professional philosophers of science and professional biologists” (O’Malley 2010b: 530-1). Some of his areas of reflection were the distinction between proximate and ultimate causes, the nature of the neo-Darwinian synthesis, and the centrality of speciation and species defined by his Biological Species Concept (see 3.a). This article will focus on Mayr’s idea of population thinking as an example of how “one scientist uses ‘scientific concepts’ to forge a conceptual tool with a wider range of historical and philosophical applicability” (Chung 2003: 278).

The population notion was already central in Mayr’s work in 1942. His main concern was the methodology of systematics. Mayr had promoted a new systematics, looking for variation in large samples as opposed to few type specimens, and considering geography, genetics, and other sources as opposed to morphology only. As Carl Chung reconstructs, Mayr was first to formulate the distinction between typological and population thinking in 1955. A few years later, Mayr (1959) started pushing population thinking as the major innovation introduced by Charles Darwin and developed by biology as a natural historical science, different and autonomous from other sciences. According to population thinking, “no two individuals or biological events are exactly the same and processes in biology can be understood only by a study of variation” (Mayr 1955, cit. in Chung 2003: 288). In opposition, Mayr described typological thinking as having its deep roots in the Western cultural tradition, particularly in Platonic philosophy: “Implicit in this concept is that variation as such is unimportant since it represents only the ‘shadows’ of the eidos” (Mayr 1955: 485), the essences or ideas that lie behind diversity. As Chung points out, the main battlefield for this opposition was the concept of species. For Mayr, the incarnation of typological thinking in biology is the morphological species concept, according to which individuals belong to the same species by virtue of sharing their morphological characteristics. By contrast, biological species concepts are population concepts. The latter take into account variation, and in particular either reproductive barriers (two populations are different species if they coexist with no fertile mating) and/or geographical variation with reproductive flow between populations.

What is interesting here is the philosophical reach of Mayr’s ideas: he consciously worked them up from his systematics field work, used them for a philosophical interpretation of biology, and tied them to broader philosophical themes. In Chung’s words, the enterprise was “an attempt to liberate certain key ideas of the ‘students of diversity’ from their disciplinary constraints, and to render them more generally applicable by repackaging them into a broader historical and philosophical distinction that pertains to all of biology” (Chung 2003: 294-5). For sure, one goal was

to legitimize the natural historical sciences, including systematics, taxonomy, and evolutionary biology, against the criticisms of ‘the new biology’—molecular, reductionistic, and drawing explicit inspiration from the physical sciences…philosophically he could argue for the ‘in principle’ need for an evolutionary (population thinking) approach in order to offer adequate and complete explanations of biological phenomena. (Chung: 295)

Population thinking, once devised, shaped Mayr’s own interpretations of the history of biology, and provided him solutions to philosophical problems such as the method and the autonomy of biology. It was generally taken up by philosophers and philosophically-minded scientists such as Michael T. Ghiselin—notice the philosophical title of his 1997 book Metaphysics and the Origin of Species. There would be many other examples from Mayr’s work in which he developed philosophical ideas out of science with precise polemic aims and great influence on all scholars of biology. Statements like the distinction between ultimate and proximate causes became common currency for scientists. This does not mean that Mayr’s ideas weren’t criticized, as they increasingly are (Ariew 2003, Laland et al. 2011, 2013).

ii. Gould and Adaptationism

Scientists may end up doing philosophy if they get interested in the inferential structure of their own field. Inference, that is reasoning and its rules,is a classic topic in philosophy of science. Induction, deduction, and inference to the best explanation (IBE) are basic, well known types of inference, but, in scientific practice, they multiply and get combined and put to work in different ways, producing interesting conceptual and philosophical problems. Stephen Jay Gould (1942-2002) was a prolific writer (see more in section 5.d). Among his many favorite targets were a few inferential patterns employed by evolutionary biologists. The adaptationist inference was definitely one of the main ones since the famous Spandrels paper with Richard Lewontin (1979). Other biologists, like G.C. Williams (1966), had advanced proposals for revising adaptationist inferences on different grounds. Gould’s campaign can be seen as an expression of him being a paleontologist with great interest in inferential patterns and with a view of evolution directly inspired to Darwin’s works.

Adaptationism consists in explaining biological phenomena by claiming that they are adaptations. In the Spandrels paper, Gould and Lewontin used the metaphor of the San Marco cathedral in Venice to argue that even structures that exploit fundamental functions can nonetheless result, originally, as structural byproducts of a whole architecture. They wanted to criticize their colleagues’ habit to tolerate lazy tests of adaptive hypotheses that “consisted in little more than a decent qualitative fit between observed behaviour or form, and a set of posited adaptive pressures and constraints” (Lewens 2008: 180). As Gould elaborated after the Spandrels paper, between structures and functions there is no one-to-one strict correspondence, but rather, redundancy. Functions are distributed over several parts of organisms, and conversely any part we may call a trait or structure is involved in several mechanisms, functions, and processes in the organism’s life. In the appreciation of trade-offs between structural internal constraints and selected functions, Gould saw a revival of Charles Darwin’s original attention to “contrivances” (1877). Adaptive explanations will rarely suffice. In any case, they will need to be made testable and tested (Pievani and Serrelli 2011). Since 1982, together with Elisabeth Vrba, Gould proposed and promoted the neologism “exaptation” to address what he saw as two evolutionary mechanisms, distinct from adaptation, involving nonetheless natural selection and primary functions: functional shift of a structure with previously different purposes, a process already identified by Darwin; and functional cooptation of a trait whose origin is non-adaptive— for example, a side effect due to a developmental constraint or a random insertion.

Gould’s ideas about adaptationism and other aspects of biological inference triggered cascades of philosophical reflections, for example on the multiplicity of meanings of adaptation: by adaptation we may mean either something ensuring or increasing fitness or something that seems designed for the performance in a particular environment, in a range of environments, or for a particular function. We may intend something which is being positively selected, or something whose existence is due to natural selection in the past (Godfrey-Smith 2001, Lewens 2008). Biologists with philosophers, or philosophically-minded biologists, reflected on adaptationism often reacting, in one sense or the other, to Gould’s school of thought. Some scholars elaborated on the dubious ontology and instrumental nature of adaptations, while many others interpreted the challenge as the necessity of making adaptationist hypotheses testable (Pievani and Serrelli, cit.). Recently, plant biologist Mark E. Olson (2012) acknowledged the relevance of the “post-Spandrels consensus” on the importance of constraints in evolution among biologists. But he also pointed out post-Spandrels proliferation of contradictory “selection vs. constraints” and “externalist vs. internalist” explanations for the same data. These contradictions were due, for Olson, to Gould’s vagueness in defining “constraint,” as well as to the lack of experimental techniques for exploring the accessibility of unobserved forms. But today’s embryological, manipulative, and comparative empirical strategies allow for experimental exploration of morphologies that are not observed in nature. By combining these techniques, biologists can turn “internalism” and “externalism” from a-priori positions into case-by-case, testable hypotheses. Also, selection and constraint are more properly seen as complementary and not in mutual contrast as, for Olson, the Spandrels paper tended to suggest. For Olson, thus, a developmental “renaissance of adaptationism” is under way.

As customary, philosophical issues raised by biologists have been taken up and elaborated further by philosophers. Commenting on the philosophical literature on adaptationism, Godfrey-Smith (2001) distinguished three different issues on which adaptationist, anti-adaptationist and moderate positions can be taken up. The empirical issue is whether or not natural selection is a powerful and ubiquitous force in the natural world, with few constraints coming from biological variation, and with no comparable, competing causal factor. The explanatory issue is whether the most important questions in biology are about the fitting of organisms and environments, given that natural selection is the only answer to such big problems (other processes and explanations are good for less important questions). The methodological issue is whether or not starting with adaptive hypotheses—and holding to them—is good scientific practice. In 2009, a special issue of Biology & Philosophy was published as both a celebration and a critical appraisal of the influence of the Spandrels paper. Therein, Lewens (2008) elaborated on Godfrey-Smith’s taxonomy, recognizing seven types of adaptationism, and arguing for the importance of asking a prerequisite question: “what is a trait?”.

b. Philosophical Issues Naturalized

The relevance and implications of biology for humanity became a thought-provoking and heartfelt issue as soon as intellectuals and laypeople reacted to Darwin’s works (1859, 1871). More than a century later, E.O. Wilson (1975) proposed a “new synthesis” as a project of explaining the most diverse human behavioral and psychological traits by means of evolutionary hypotheses. Wilson’s proposal led to sociobiology and more recently to evolutionary psychology (Barkow et al. 1992). Human behavior, mind, morality, and systems of beliefs constitute the most interesting targets of possible, and controversial, naturalization. Naturalization is what happens when matters that are traditionally philosophical become empirically accessible by some scientific approach or method. David Hull wrote provocatively that “Philosophy lost physics, then biology, then psychology. Geometry, logic and mathematics became separate disciplines with no necessary ties to philosophy,” therefore philosophers hold very tenaciously to “epistemology, metaphysics, ethics and aesthetics” (Hull 2002: 124), because many of their other objects have been taken by science. But Hull also optimistically observed that one of the strengths of philosophy of biology “is that philosophers and biologists have ignored this distinction, working with each other on both sides of the divide” (Ivi: 117). In fact, naturalization is critically analyzed by philosophy, and there are many different philosophical positions on naturalism. So, naturalization is a fruitful object of study for philosophy of biology rather than a topic thief, and philosophy has a warranted place that is not going to evaporate by naturalization.

Philosophers’ reactions to Wilson’s “new synthesis” were, for Hull, a virtuous example of interactivity. After an initial wholesale opposition, many of them validated the challenge of naturalizing humans. Our species has to be seen as a proper part of the biological world, not as separated by any ontological divide. At the same time, philosophers highlighted inferential errors in biological explanations of human behaviors, epistemological limits in reconstructing the past, and ethical risks. They pursued theoretical refinements of the project, by improving multi-level selection models, for example. Many criticized the logical-deductive architecture of sociobiology and evolutionary psychology, frequently built on ad hoc hypotheses and adaptationist just-so stories. The debate is ongoing, and many arguments have been developed. For example, if many human psychological mechanisms are evolutionary novelties due to the interaction of ancestral genes and new environments, then many of these mechanisms are not adaptations and adaptive thinking in evolutionary psychology will fail to identify or explain them. More cautious, problematized, and integrated endeavors of biological explanation applied to humans are emerging, also under the stimulation of philosophy of biology (Sterelny 2003).

i. An Example: The Biology of Morality

It was for explaining human morality that Darwin hinted at ‘group selection’ (see 3.b), and the endeavor wasn’t finished with him. Evolutionary ethics, the association of morality with natural selection and evolution, provides good ground to Rosenberg and McShea’s remark that biology “ the only scientific discipline that anyone has ever supposed might be able to answer the questions of moral and political philosophy” (2008: 3). Fast growing fields like neurobiology or cognitive neurosciences seem to be making biology more and more capable of addressing topics such as the origins of morality. Philosopher Patricia Churchland (2011), for example, studied the scientific literature and hypothesized a particular pattern of neural activation that would constitute a “neurobiological platform” for morality. Churchland highlighted the role played in this platform by molecules such as oxytocin, an ancient and simple peptide, found in all vertebrates. In mammals, oxytocin “is at the hub of the intricate network of mammalian adaptations for caring for others” (Churchland 2011: 14). In fact, morality would share its neurobiological platform with other familiar phenomena of human life—attachment and bonding. More generally, “the palette of neurochemicals affecting neurons and muscles is substantially the same across vertebrates and invertebrates” (Churchland 2011: 45). Among mammals, then, there is a wide “range of social patterns…, but underlying them are probably different arrangements of receptors for oxytocin and other hormones and neurochemicals” (p. 32). The striking thing is, for Churchland, that modest modifications in existing neural structures can lead to new outcomes. Morality and other phenomena would result from a not-so-exceptional modification of a pre-existing platform involved in mammalian parental cares. Churchland’s picture of evolution is again a familiar Gouldian one (4.a.ii):

Biological evolution does not achieve adaptations by designing a whole new mechanism from scratch, but modifies what is already in place, little bit by little bit. Social emotions, values, and behavior are not the result of a wholly new engineering plan, but rather an adaptation of existing arrangements and mechanisms that are intimately linked with the self-preserving circuitry for fighting, freezing, and flight, on the one hand, and for rest and digest, on the other. (Churchland 2011: 46)

Does the evolutionary continuity from mammalian parental care to morality constrain ethics and traditional philosophical theories of morality? Churchland’s view, while being only an example, is interesting in its intermediate position between strict biological determinism and cultural determinism. While biology can provide information and explanation on the platform for morality, the complexity of cultures provides scaffolding for moral development and definition so that moral decision remains a practical, dialogic, and social problem. However, the more general question is whether and how should moral philosophy—a large and highly technical field—take into any account what the sciences are discovering. The answers to this question are expected to come from philosophical studies of naturalization (Dupré 2001, De Caro and Macarthur 2004). In any case, most philosophers of biology recognize a naturalistic fallacy in the idea that knowing more about the natural world would suffice for making moral, political, and social decisions.

ii. Philosophy Versus Naturalization?

To some philosophers, the naturalization of philosophical problems is rather uncontroversial, to the point that “the difference between philosophy and theoretical science is not a matter of kind but of degree,” and the domain of philosophy is partly “the sum of all the questions to which science cannot (yet) answer” (Rosenberg and McShea 2008: 5). For many others, defining philosophy as some kind of underdeveloped science is an expression of scientism and a category mistake regarding fields of knowledge. Many philosophers point out that the biological explanation of social actions, behaviors, and culture, may imply a Darwinian dimension without boiling down to it. Naturalism is related to, but different from, other very general issues, like determinism or reductionism. Some philosophers draw a distinction between a strong “scientistic” naturalism and a pluralistic, or “liberalized,” naturalism (De Caro and Macarthur 2004). Scientistic naturalism considers philosophy as a branch of the natural sciences. Liberalized naturalism includes different epistemic levels of analysis of human nature—from natural sciences to humanities—that share the exclusion of non-natural causes or principles.

Emphasizing the impact of biology on human capacities, social institutions, and ethical values is also a way to justify philosophy of biology as useful or even indispensable to philosophy and, more generally, to the humanities. Some presentations of philosophy of biology tend to justify the field by its particularity of “concerning human affairs” (Rosenberg and McShea 2008: 8) and its being ultimately oriented to them. Some authors (Pradeu 2009) dislike this anthropocentric strategy in philosophy of biology and think the field could be otherwise justified. Under these overarching debates, human organisms and the human species are understandably a hotspot of problems for philosophy of biology, and biologists and philosophers must confront the growing biological knowledge of humans.

The neurobiology of morality (4.b.i) is not automatically a subtraction of morality as a philosophical problem. Indeed, many reflections from a scientifically-informed philosophy are of primary importance to maintain vigilance and scrutiny: what are the aims and uses of these biological studies of humans? Could they be used, for example, for a classification of people with consequences on the distribution of rights? Would this be justified? Would the consequent choices and decisions be acceptable? How are scientific results co-opted in clinical practice and health care? How are communication issues with patients handled? How influential are social and cultural biases in the construction of the object of research? Is this acceptable and justifiable? What ideas of morality underlie the studies? Scientists working in these difficult grounds will constantly exercise philosophical thought (see also 5.b). For them, the rich tradition of moral philosophy might constitute a precious aid.

Meanwhile, philosophy of biology can inform philosophy about new and obsolete approaches in the scientific explanation of morality. Evolutionary ethics is not necessarily tied to adaptationism (4.a.ii) or genetic determinism. The evolution of morality seems to resemble more bricolage than engineering. Against stereotypical and simplified views of evolution, morality cannot be identified with a set of genes, even though genes do not necessarily lose their importance, and the question about heritable patterns remains crucial in order to define what morality is in evolution.

Philosophy of biology can fight easy deterministic conclusions or identifications between naturalism and determinism while promoting useful definitions of the concepts involved: what is to be intended for morality in different contexts, and why finding an underlying arrangement of receptors is not going to replace the need for ethical reasoning and moral philosophy. Science is a form of knowledge and therefore subject to epistemology, conceptual analysis and change, and ethical reasoning. On the other hand, biology constantly brings new fuel to philosophical inquiry, even, perhaps especially, when philosophical issues get naturalized.

5. Philosophy Bringing the Life Sciences out of Their Research Context

There are multiple senses in which philosophy of biology brings the life sciences out of their research contexts. First, philosophy of biology can study and sometimes aid interactions among the life sciences or between them and other sciences. Second, sometimes philosophy is seen as capable of developing messages, ways of thinking, and their consequences and implications to elaborate a “philosophy of nature” and an overall vision of the living world (Godfrey-Smith 2009, p. 15). Third, philosophy can reflect on the roles and meanings of science and on the interactions between science and society with an approach different from that of the social sciences. In this way, it can assume critical points of view towards biology and reflect on how scientific claims are, could be, and should be received and elaborated by the public.

a. Philosophy of Biology at Intersections

What happens when different scientific fields or points of view come into intimate contact? Philosophy of biology has always been happily and effectively involved in this matter. A classic example (seen above, 3.a) is the analysis of coexistence, interaction, and implicit reciprocal dependencies between “the morphological, the physiological, and the genetical” viewpoints in taxonomy (Hull 1969: 176-7). Philosophers of biology often notice attractions and tensions and call for integrations. They attend to emergent relationships among life sciences, as in the topical cases of micro- and macroevolution (Serrelli and Gontier 2015b) and evo-devo (see below), or between biology and other sciences, as in cultural evolution studies. Classic debates in philosophy of science, for example on reductionism, provide conceptual coordinates for thinking about these connections.

A major development in biology began in the 1980s, when technical and theoretical advancements enabled the molecular study of development, opening the possibility of relating development to evolution in different ways (Gilbert et al. 1996, Minelli 2010, Olson 2012). Evo-devo, evolutionary developmental biology, was born. The contact was all the more significant because embryology, a discipline with an ancient tradition, had long been seen as far removed from evolutionary biology. Many evo-devo protagonists and observers framed evo-devo within the insufficiency of the mathematical study of the intergenerational transmission of genes. This hegemonic field, population genetics, considered development as a “black box” and assumed a linear relation between genotype and phenotype (Laubichler 2010). In doing so, it would be blind to fundamental kinds of evolutionary innovation, incapable of addressing macroevolutionary change (Minelli 2010), and, more deeply, non-mechanistic, based on “conceptual abstractions” (Laubichler, cit.). Yet, many scholars are pursuing a pluralistic integration. They point out that

To deny the internal consistency and the explanatory power of [the research program developed from population genetics] would be obviously foolish…. The objection is that there can (and should) be more to evolutionary biology than a research program restricted to the concepts and tools of population genetics (Minelli, cit.: 216).

Some scientists and philosophers focus on a broader polemic target: the Modern Synthesis, that is the foundation of evolutionary biology as it is practiced today, which happened between the 1910s and 1940s and was further canonized mainly by Ernst Mayr in the subsequent decades. Critics analyze how the Modern Synthesis excluded lines of research as non-legitimate or irrelevant to evolution, while successfully pulling together Darwin’s natural selection, Mendel’s theory of inheritance, mathematical models of population genetics, and the work of the most disparate fields in biology (Gilbert et al. 1996, Serrelli 2015). Some philosophers and scientists are therefore proposing the idea of an Extended Evolutionary Synthesis (Pigliucci and Müller 2010). These movements are very interesting to philosophers of biology. They provide new access to traditional philosophical issues about scientific change, including the unity and disunity of science (Fodor 1974, Callebaut 2010). They also invoke a necessary collaboration between history and philosophy of science, as shown by works that revised the received views on the nature of the divorce of embryology and evolution in the 1930s (Love 2003, Griesemer 2007 cf. section 7).

Philosophy of biology’s remarkable interest in cultural evolution studies is an example involving relationships between biology and other fields. The idea of similarities across biological and cultural evolution was already suggested by Darwin and his contemporaries, and several approaches were formalized in the second half of the 20th century (Cavalli Sforza and Feldman 1981, Boyd and Richerson 1985). Cultural change and stability are understood in terms of variation, selection, and inheritance/transmission of cultural traits, only requiring some correlation in cultural transmission from cultural parents (models from whom a cultural trait is acquired) to offspring (individuals acquiring the cultural trait). These evolution-inspired approaches to culture allow for a variety of unique mechanisms for cultural transmission, and incorporate processes like drift and multi-level selection. Capitalizing on such approaches, some social scientists are proposing that methods, findings, and theories be systematically exchanged between the biological and cultural sciences, particularly between disciplines that lie at the same level on a micro-to-macro scale (Mesoudi et al. 2006). This trans-disciplinarity is sometimes presented as the beginning of a late and needed evolutionary synthesis in the social sciences, similar to the Modern Synthesis in biology, but some philosophers think this is an overstatement while others think the claim is based on a naïve epistemological conception (Serrelli 2016a).

Similar proposals call philosophers of biology into question. The abstract formulations and philosophical issues of natural selection, multi-level selection, and drift (3.b) can help to evaluate the appropriateness of transfers of methods and theories (Godfrey-Smith 2009). General topics like population thinking (4.a.i) and adaptationism (4.a.ii), or reductionism will emerge in cultural evolution too. Progressionism is another very basic issue here. The misleading idea of progress was in fact roughly applied in anthropology by evolutionists in the past with potentially discriminatory effects and reductionist justifications of essential diversities within the human species. Now, philosophy can assist cultural anthropology in updating old stereotyped worries about progressionism, overcoming a derived prejudice against naturalism as such. A coherent and analytical criticism of any form of teleological and progressive evolutionism could thus be a way to reconstruct the broken bridge between cultural anthropology and evolutionary studies (Panebianco and Serrelli 2016a).  Cultural evolution also raises deep epistemological problems, not only about definitions of terms like ‘culture’, but also about the knowledge processes that are ongoing in this intensification of contact between the biological and social sciences (Serrelli 2016b, Panebianco and Serrelli 2016b).

b. Biology’s Critical Friend

As we have seen, philosophy of biology is expected to help science and to work hard to keep up with scientific research. But many authors point out that philosophy must not forget its critical role towards science. One perspective on philosophy of science sees it as an enterprise that aims “to understand the life of science, that is, to understand the development of science as a Wittgensteinian family of ongoing human epistemic practices” (Reydon 2005: 252, cf. Grene and Depew 2004). Science can be seen as a part of culture and as a sub-system of society. This critical perspective on science, with its complex relationship with society, is always available to philosophers. Authors like Linda Van Speybroeck expressed the concern that philosophy of science might become “…a servant of science, leaving science undisturbed and calling only for a ‘justification’ of the philosophical practice against scientific standards” (Van Speybroeck 2007: 54).

Stephen Jay Gould’s critique of progressionism in paleontology and paleoanthropology, and his opposition to human racial classification and measurements of intelligence, are examples of constructive criticisms of the scientific enterprise. Current knowledge overwhelmingly shows that human evolution is a bushy tree of coexistent and sometimes interacting hominin species (compare Ruse 2012). But cultural and psychological biases have shaped science in some periods. Human evolution was expected to be, and represented as, a ladder of progress, a sequence of progressively more evolved hominid species, substituting one another, and approaching Homo sapiens, the climax species, often represented as a European male (Eldredge and Tattersall 1982). Stephen Jay Gould, in books such as Wonderful Life (1989), with a peculiar method that could be called an archaeology of scientific ideas (Pievani 2012a), coined expressions like the “iconography of hope” and tied them to social history, to some deep teleological preferences, and to our habit of using the present as a key for understanding the past. For many years, Gould fought for human evolution to be separated from human hopes, satisfying tales, and “great narratives.” He concentrated on the jargon, distinguishing evolution and progress, trend and finality, and stressing the ambiguous and appealing fashion for terms like “missing link.” Gould’s critical metaphors put paleoanthropology in contact with the larger cultural context and deeper psychological roots, helping to reinforce the theoretical normalization of human evolution into a branching model of diversification of species, typical of the broader phylogenetic tree of primates.

Gould’s way of reasoning was particularly apt in showing that science is a human activity. Scientists work on the ground of cultural and social biases; they are not naïve collectors of neutral facts. Although Gould was not a sociological relativist, he showed in many cases the importance of history in shaping science, where ideas may also be dismissed and then taken up again. This attitude is also found in Eldredge and Gould’s (1972) famous “punctuated equilibria” paper, where the two paleontologists revealed the deep theory-laden nature  of fossil interpretation. The ubiquitous pattern of evolutionary stasis over geological time periods was neglected since Darwin (1859), who considered fossils a constitutionally incomplete documentation. But the pattern of stasis and punctuation was, as Eldredge and Gould pointed out, data, not lack of data. “Phyletic gradualism” was a consolidated assumption that had been blinding even paleontologists towards their own data, while perpetuating the subordinate position of paleontologists with respect to theoretically important fields. In fact, Eldredge and Gould formulated a theory that explained punctuations as speciation events, and stasis by other processes. In doing so, they posed several problems, among which was the legitimation of paleontology as a theoretically relevant field.

In The Mismeasure of Man (1981) Gould argued against the general scientific attitude of attaching “universal essences” to human disparities by measuring what is not measurable, like intelligence quotient, an artificial construct. He also exposed unconscious manipulations of the anthropometric measurements and ranking of skulls in Samuel G. Morton’s work (Crania Americana, 1839): Morton believed in “races” and in their polygenic origin, and he believed human intelligence was a unitary and inheritable object. Gould found his measurements as biased by his self-confirming preconceptions. For Gould, any scientist is an unconscious victim of his or her preconceptions. Recent studies of Morton’s material (Lewis et al., 2011) rehabilitated Morton’s original measurements. The authors hypothesized that Gould’s severe analysis was biased by his own aprioristic egalitarian and liberal cultural beliefs. “In a paradoxical way Steve had proved his own point”, Ian Tattersall observed (2013). No scientist can be immune to this kind influences, against which, for Gould, “vigilance and scrutiny” are the necessary, although insufficient, palliations. Along these lines, philosophy of biology is invited to take on its critical constructive role towards science.

c. Developing Messages from Biology

Many topics in philosophy of biology are evidently relevant in the relationship between biology and the public. Deciding the meaning of concepts, like natural selection, fitness, or function, requires an understanding of the theories and their domains (Rosenberg and McShea 2008). Philosophy of biology clarifies, for example, that “‘natural selection’ is not an entirely apt name for the process [it identifies], as it misleadingly suggests the notions of choice, desire, and belief built into the theological account of adaptations” (p. 17) and corrects popular descriptions of evolution that make it look tautological and unscientific. The notoriously slow-changing world of science education and public understanding is under pressure by the impressive rate of life sciences growth. In the popularization of science, hominid evolution is still depicted in a linear sequence of species from simple to complex, from inferior to superior, from archaic to modern. It exhibits intuitive power, not to neglect the prospective endurance of other influential pictures, like the tree of life, that are being questioned and made complex. And any time a naturalistic study of humans is carried out, misunderstandings and dangerous “genes-for-morality”-kind interpretations are just around the corner, both in the form of quick reductionistic and deterministic claims and in the form of a-priori anti-naturalistic positions. Even important scientific advances, like evo-devo and other fields that are pushing for an Extended Evolutionary Synthesis, can be negligently interpreted as breaking-offs, invalidating all the previous knowledge. Opponents of science can use this to covertly reintroduce non-naturalist and non-scientific explanations. Instead, philosophy of biology could help citizens become more scientific, and more able to exploit the directional role they have towards science (cf. Haarsma et al. 2014-2015).

According to a principle called “scientific citizenship,” science should be properly understood by everyone in society. A fundamental pillar is a shared awareness of “the nature of science” which is the wealth of philosophical reflections about what is science, what is biology, how is our scientific knowledge best acquired, and how much can we be confident in it (Matthews 1994). What are the ways of thinking used in biology that can help people to get a grasp of it? Are they similar to everyday ways of reasoning? What are the possible conceptual traps and pitfalls? What kind of knowledge can we expect from ecological simulations? What are model organisms, and why is it important to establish and fund them? What kinds of predictions can really be made, for example, in medicine or ecology? Understanding the probabilistic nature of predictions would produce not only a more educated picture of nature, but also, for example, an “awakening of public opinion to environmental problems, hydro-geological instability, and maintenance of territory” (Pievani 2012b: 352).

Philosophy of biology’s endeavor can sometimes go far away from day-to-day biology, and work out general pictures, messages, and worldviews. A classic and pervasive example is “Universal Darwinism,” developed by Richard Dawkins, Daniel Dennett and others (Dawkins 1983) along a reasoning line from kin selection theory to a “gene’s eye view” to a “replicator view”. According to the “selfish gene” part of the argument (Dawkins 1976), reliably replicating molecules (precursors of genes) would be at the origin of life, and organisms including humans would be late-comer vehicles built up in all their minute details by genes that survived the competition. The selfish gene has been particularly appealing and controversial for its philosophical implications. We are unaware machines for our genes, whose interests furthermore sometimes conflict with (and win over) ours. The selfish gene view even came to be considered the official version of Darwinism, being the one defended and advocated on many public stages against non-scientific views. Universal Darwinism is a philosophical view, according to which natural selection, intended as the selective retention and accumulation of blind variations that prove to be stable and fit, is the fundamental mechanism in the Universe. Many philosophers of biology fought these views and all their philosophical implications, seeing them as a hardly justified reification of some methodologically operationalized idealizations by population genetics (Oyama et al. 2001). Other lines of attack were the incredible polisemy and theoretical complexity of “gene” and the ongoing revision of their causal power on the organism (Griffths and Stotz 2013). Critics were all the more motivated by their discontent with the picture of evolutionary biology that was being conveyed to the public and to philosophy by the selfish gene view. Many philosophers pointed out that natural selection is arbitrarily chosen as a process to be universalized into a general philosophical view (Godfrey-Smith 2009), and some outlined provocative alternative views like Universal Symbiogenesis (Gontier 2007).

Other philosophical views were elaborated from the importance of chance, randomness, and, more comprehensively, contingency in evolution. Philosophers point out studies demonstrating that chance variation can influence evolutionary outcomes without being constrained or directed: “Evolutionary divergence is sometimes due to differences in the order of appearance of chance variations, and not to differences in the direction of selection” (Beatty 2010: 39). Since the 1980s, the neutral theory of genetic evolution promoted by Motoo Kimura (Ohta & Kimura 1971), now developed in weak neutralism in the scientific community (Hartl & Clark 2007), exposed the huge proportion of neutral variation all around. Population genetics models show that important events like speciation can well happen in conditions of fitness neutrality (Gavrilets 2004). Much earlier, population geneticists demonstrated the importance of drift (see above, 2.a). But is evolution random or contingent at any spatio-temporal scale? Are there law-like tendencies in large-scale evolution? If so, do these concern adaptedness, complexity, or other features? Since environments change over time, “what is adaptive” changes constantly through evolutionary time, so there is no strict commitment in the Darwinian theory to long-term adaptive progress or trends (Serrelli and Gontier 2015a).

Are trends towards greater complexity a better candidate? Some philosophers think so (McShea and Brandon 2010). Others think that nothing in the current understanding of evolution predicts a drive towards increased complexity. Another main disagreement concerns how to define complexity— is it through the integrated organization of interrelated parts in a whole or just through the number and diversity of parts? Some philosophers see evolution as a texture of contingent histories, the most ordinary—but most relevant to us—being the story of our species and their relatives. The human tree is just like that of other mammals. This emerging view is very different from the one inspired by Universal Darwinism:

Evolution is a process that abounds in redundancies and imperfections, and adaptation could be a collateral effect rather than a direct optimisation. Biology is a field of potentialities, and not determinations…. Complex organisms exist thanks to imperfections, to multiplicity of use and redundancy. (Pievani 2012a: 142)

For authors like Stephen Jay Gould, the preeminence of ecological contingencies and macro-evolutionary patterns, like mass-extinctions, in natural history seems to dismiss any idea of progress in evolution:

We are the offspring of the material and contingent relationships between localised populations and ever-changing environments. The massive contingency of human evolution means that particular events, or apparently meaningless details, were able to shape irreversibly the course of natural history. (Ivi: 139)

Some theorists identify the source of contingency in the complex interplay between ecological systems and genealogical entities at multiple and very diverse scales (Eldredge et al. 2016).

From the disruption of the idea of a great progressive tendency in evolution, in particular human evolution, some philosophers develop general implications. Evolutionary humility results from a naturalistic way of seeing Homo sapiens as a part of a contingent process and not as its culmination. From another point of view, the discovery of the determinant role of contingent ecological events like floods and earthquakes gives a new vision of nature. Nature is neither a harmonic Eden nor a wicked nemesis. “The expressions of violence and unpredictability of natural phenomena that shock our societies so much today are the normal ecological niches where we were born. We would not be here at this moment without them” (Pievani 2012b: 352).

6. Scientifically Up-to-Date Philosophy

In a famous paper titled “What the philosophy of biology is not,” David Hull wrote that any work in philosophy of biology should not skip “all the intricacy of evolutionary relationships, the difficulties with various mechanisms, the recalcitrant data, the wealth of supporting evidence” (Hull 1969: 162). Along the same line, philosophy of biology tends to be grounded on deep knowledge and understanding of current biology by maintaining a non-episodic familiarity with many fields that are outside philosophical specialization.

It is important to keep in mind that the life sciences and their objects change and grow. A basic example is the very definition of “life” (bios). Answers, as well as philosophical problems, for such a topic come, for example, from scientific research on the origin of life (Penny 2005) or the search for extra-terrestrial life. The origin of life has been considered as a backwards extension of the roots of the tree of common descent. It regresses from some universal “ancestral organisms” (LUCA, Last Universal Common Ancestor) to simpler, minimally living entities that might be referred to as “protoliving systems,” and it further dissolves into non-living matter along several dimensions (Malaterre 2010). In general, philosophers work together with biologists on interpreting the history of life, for example, on trying to make sense of major evolutionary transitions (Maynard Smith and Szathmáry 1995). The symbiogenesis of eukaryotes and the advent of multicellularity are examples of major transitions. Those few moments in the history of life may be seen as points of emergence of a new level of organization. Today the very idea of a tree of life is being challenged by evidence of massive transfers and blurred boundaries among its branches (O’Malley 2010a). The history of biology is a history of changing views of life and of its history, and philosophy of biology participates into this process.

In the 50 years of existence of philosophy of biology as an academic field, the expansion of life sciences has been explosive. Huge global problems like climate change, biodiversity loss, new forms of diseases, and needs for resource management in our societies have contributed to that growth. Life sciences, including biomedical, ecological, and microbiological fields, have faced challenges related to the Modern world, not only by being called into question or by actively catching opportunities to develop big research projects and programs but also by contributing to the very discovery and perception of those challenges. In parallel, life sciences have seen incredible technical advancements: cheaper and faster technologies for DNA sequencing and molecular analysis; computational methods allowing analysis of billions nucleotides in search for the most likely phylogeny and simulations of evolution of proteins or complex phenotypes; huge shared information databases like the genome projects (such as genomics, proteomics, metabolomics), particularly the Human Genome and the various “–omics” projects monitoring whole complexes of functional molecules; finally, the applications of these technical advancements in creating new kinds of organisms or in disease detection and therapy. A parallel phenomenon of the decades leading into the 21st century has been the explosion and availability of scientific literature and access.

What are the consequences for philosophy of biology? The discipline is supposed to have a role not only in understanding, describing, and communicating science but also in aiding the development of scientific programs. Given the explosive historical dynamics outlined above, almost every subfield of biology requires much of a philosopher to delve into its peculiar concepts, methods, objects, and conceptual issues. Hence, several presentations of philosophy of biology follow a field-by-field criterion, enumerating items like “philosophy of ecology” or “philosophy of molecular biology” (Griffiths 2011). Such multi-field presentations reflect the dynamic and lively development of biology. Meanwhile, periodical shifts of focus and emergence of new fields and techniques in the scientific literature, attract the curiosity and calling for the contribution of philosophers. But the identities of supposed sub-fields like “philosophy of ecology” or “philosophy of microbiology” are not crystallized, and rarely will a philosopher of biology self-limits to one sub-field. Therefore, the field-by-field approach is not followed here.

This first section provides a few examples of how philosophers of biology can chase the developments of some particular field of life sciences. In certain moments, this pursuit can lead to extensions of philosophy of biology itself to embrace not only new scientific knowledge, but also newborn ways of doing science. Furthermore, deep revisions of philosophical approaches themselves may be necessary to address new aspects of science, namely facets of scientific practice. The examples concern molecular studies of gene exchange that started in microbial evolution, advances in ecological modeling, and the construction and management of model organisms.

a. Questioning Influential Ideas

In recent years, several philosophers have become interested in the growing evidence for a variety of gene exchange mechanisms widespread in fungi, plants, and animals, not only in prokaryotes (unicellular organisms that have long been known to wildly transform, conjugate and acquire DNA by transduction). Following biologists such as W. Ford Doolittle, philosophers contrasted this evidence with the idea of a universal tree of life as a tree of sexually reproducing, genetically isolated species that multiply by genetic isolation. For O’Malley (2010b), the idea of a universal tree of life has come to be an unacceptable reach given the abundance of reticulation and lateral gene transfer (LGT) in all kinds of organisms, including animals. O’Malley proposed to give up

an animal-centric philosophy of evolution. Its key tenets are that the BSC (Biological Species Concept) is ‘universal’ to species-forming organisms, that bifurcating lines of descent are all that matter in ancestry reconstruction, and that the rest of life (non-animal) is simpler, less diverse, and less ‘true’ evolutionarily. The consequences of [such an] animal-centric philosophy of evolution are that it can include at best a severely truncated history of evolutionary events. (p. 544)

The animal-based, constraining idea of a universal tree of life was consolidated around the mid-20th century through an attempt of “excluding the messy”, such as prokaryotes and bacteria. For O’Malley, such exclusion was mainly due to the influence of ornithologist and philosopher Ernst Mayr.

As this example illustrates, philosophers, by following frontier developments of particular fields, can sense the need for a revision of overarching theoretical choices and frames of biology. At the same time, they can wriggle out of canonical problems and concepts and expand their philosophical interests: “It is definitely the case – for O’Malley – that philosophy of biology has undergone a rapid radiation of topics in the last decade and this has meant going beyond Mayr’s focus” (544). The resilience of issues like the species concept, molded on animal breeding, is pushed by new concepts amenable to philosophical analysis. Further, the very task and range of philosophy of biology happen to be questioned: “Mayr’s vision of philosophy of biology as the clarification of evolutionary concepts has…been challenged” (O’Malley 2010b: 531).

b. Understanding New Scientific Practices

According to philosopher Thomas Pradeu (2009), ecology has made “a conspicuous and very welcome entry” in philosophy of biology, and several philosophers advocate aspects of ecology as targets of philosophical attention. Ecology has its own epistemological issues, for example, the weakness of ecological laws, the debate around the idea of balance of nature, the complex problem of the predictive value of ecological models, and the involvement in environmental decision making (Cooper 2003, Mikkelson 2007, Plutynski 2008). Other problems concern the individuation of ecological units, scale-dependence, and generalizability of ecological models. Some philosophers got interested in new modeling methodologies of ecological inquiry, the area of the following example.

Ecologist Steven Peck (2008) contributed to the debate from the standpoint of an author of complex computer simulations. He pointed out the many differences between simulations and “analytic models” which can be written as mathematical equations. In simulations, many of the entities, “dispositions,” rules, and relationships, are not captured by any equation, rather they are directly written in computer code: “conditional if-then statements, looping structures, and calls to procedures” (Peck 2008: 390). Moreover, simulations are not at all complicated versions of analytic models because, as Peck explains,

The complex computer representation is an ecological system. One that you have complete control over, but which provides insights and allows complex behavior to bubble up from lower level processes and allows one to capture the emergent behavior often seen in ecological systems. (p. 387)

For Peck, models of this kind are provocative for philosophical issues, such as what are models? What are their aims? How do they work? A classic and influential framework by Richard Levins (1966) identifies three constraints among which a model has to trade-off—generality, precision, and realism. But building a simulation, for Peck, does not consist in adding more variables and parameters in order to capture more parts and processes of some targeted biological system. It is a creative effort yielding something autonomous with interesting but complex relationships with other models and with the world. Some notions in the philosophy of modeling can make a step in the direction of simulations, like the idea of “indirect representation” in which the model descriptions themselves are examined as opposed to “direct representation” in which representation is used to describe a real-world system (Godfrey-Smith 2006). But this distinction for Peck is not enough to capture the fact that simulations become experimental systems in themselves. Playing with the model means a “bracketing out of nature to explore the model itself [yielding] important insights to the model – separate from what it is supposed to represent” (Peck 2008: 395).

Complex computer simulations push philosophy of biology to reflect on new accounts of model building and interpretation, and also to deal with new ways in which scientific communities structure themselves.

c. Rethinking the Philosophical Approach from New Ways of Doing Science

Chasing the state of the art of life sciences—even of one or few fields at once—is very demanding. By doing it, however, philosophers of biology can continually fuel their thought. We have seen, for example, that philosophers, relying on molecular discoveries about gene exchange, can revise their agenda, downplaying traditionally-framed problems (for example, what is a species?) and even questioning great background pictures against which biology is thought (the tree of life, for example). By striving to understand scientific methodologies, including completely new ones such as computer simulations in ecology, philosophers are brought to probe their accounts of science to work out new ones, and to get a better hold on them and their connections. Related to all these efforts there is another tension in philosophy of science, which has been made explicit in the last few years: the philosophical orientation toward scientific practice (Boumans and Leonelli 2013). A recent trend, represented, for example, by the Society for Philosophy of Science in Practice (SPSP), is pointing out the limits of an exclusive use of conceptual analysis, proposing instead “a philosophy of scientific practice based on an analytic framework that takes into consideration theory, practice and the world simultaneously” (Boumans et al. 2011). Practice is defined as an ensemble of “organized or regulated activities aimed at the achievement of certain goals” and is an object of philosophical reflection.

Steven Peck’s analysis of ecological simulation, mentioned earlier, can also be seen as an example of a call to scientific practice. For Peck, simulations are more of experimental systems than representations. A simulation is useful because it helps “thinking more deeply and creatively into the nature of the problem” (Peck 2008: 396), but it can be appreciated only by considering the community in which the authors of the simulation are present and maintain the simulation (otherwise, the simulation dies because it cannot be understood or replicated by others). Crucial aspects are the authors’ willingness to expose the multiple perspectives that are encoded in the simulation, to confront them with other modelers and with “those who study the ecology of natural systems directly” (p. 399), and the authors’ engagement in discussing, modifying, and exploring the simulation further. In this new kind of engagement, Peck sees a “hermeneutic circle,” a “back and forth conversation among modelers, their models, and those who study the ecology of natural systems directly” characterized by each actor’s attempt to “understand her own perspective in light of others’ perspectives.” The hermeneutic circle is, for Peck, what “opens the door to deeper understanding of what the simulation model is showing us about the world” (p. 399). Scientific community practices are crucial for understanding what’s going on. Logical analysis, either of the model alone or of its relationships with some natural ecological system, does not seem to bring philosophy a long way.

Another example of a rising scientific practice is constituted by model organisms, a term introduced in the late 1990s and becoming more and more used. Official lists of model organisms include species such as the mouse, zebrafish, fruit fly, nematode worm, thale cress. Mice and other animals are extremely important in biomedical research due to the extrapolations to Homo sapiens that are considered possible with some conditions (Piotrowska 2013). In philosophy of biology, there has been interest in understanding what “model organisms” are and in demarcating them against the larger set of experimental organisms. Ankeny and Leonelli (2011) define model organisms as:

Non-human species that are extensively studied in order to understand a range of biological phenomena, with the hope that data and theories generated through use of the model will be applicable to other organisms, particularly those that are in some way more complex than the original model. (p. 313)

The two philosophers work out several concepts embedded in this definition in order to capture the specificity of model organisms. For the issue at hand, the most important aspect is the new kind of structured scientific communities that maintain a model organism stable in space and time. Examples of model organisms are the fly Drosophila melanogaster that has been studied since the dawn of genetics, knockout mice Mus musculus, and the plant Arabidopsis thaliana. The research community of a model organism performs intensive research with “a strong ethos of sharing resource materials, techniques, and data” (p. 317). While initially the organism can be chosen for experimental advantages (being easy to breed, for example), the cumulative establishment of techniques, practices, and results—for example, through databases and stock centers—leads to self-reinforcing standardization, comparability, and stability: “…the more the model system is studied, and the greater the number of perspectives from which it is understood, the more it becomes established as a model system” (Creager et al. 2007: 6).

To summarize, a recent stream in philosophy of biology associates the need for first-hand, recent, and deep scientific information with a need to consider newly emerged scientific practices that often involve innovative scientific communities and that are capable to generate new questions. It is no surprise that philosopher Leonelli, in a paper on different modes of abstraction that are performed by different communities on the model organism Arabidopsis thaliana, writes: “Focusing primarily on modelling practices, rather than on models thus produced, might prove a useful way to gain insight on some long-standing debates within the philosophy of scientific modelling and representation” (Leonelli 2007: 510). By following biology, philosophy rethinks its own methods and foundations.

7. History and Philosophy of Biology

Good philosophy of biology may be done non-historically, by working in a purely conceptual way. On the other hand, philosophy is sometimes specifically interested in grand historical processes. The inception of empirical and theoretical novelties and the birth of whole new fields provide the opportunity to probe classic accounts of scientific change such as Popper’s falsificationism (Popper 1935, 1963), Kuhn’s paradigm change (Kuhn 1962), Lakatos’s methodology of scientific programmes (Lakatos 1970), or Kitcher’s theoretical unification (Kitcher 1981). Philosophical categories such as reductionism can be tested in their capability to account for the historical relationships between biological fields. At the birth of molecular genetics, for example, a philosophical question was whether the older Mendelian genetics was being reduced to it. As Griffiths (2010) remarks, philosophers of biology achieved more adequate models of theory by debating whether or not the molecular revolution in biology was a case of successful scientific reduction.

At all scales, philosophy of biology has a constant need to refer to history, while some authors complain that philosophy of biology pays too little attention “to the question how and why things in the field have become the way they are today” (Reydon 2005: 149-150). The rediscovered interdependence between history and philosophy of biology may be seen in light of the more general problem of the “history and philosophy of science” (HPS) studies, which has been viewed in a more integrated way. The recursive and expansive dynamics between history and philosophy of biology proves to be a generator of dense and complex elaborations in all the involved fields.

James Griesemer (2007) constitutes an example of how philosophical views serve historical analysis. The topic is the molecular study of development at the heart of evo-devo (see also 5.a). Griesemer suggests a revision of conventional narratives that describe evo-devo as a union between genetics and development, the study of which was supposedly abandoned since the 1930s (see Gilbert et al. 1996). For Griesemer this separation between fields is artificial: embryology and genetics have always been “like the segments of a centipede: moving together with limited autonomy” (p. 376). Griesemer’s long, reframing argument goes through the philosophical characterization of scientists as process followers: “there is no doubt that scientists do follow processes, that this is an important and central activity in their work, and that they achieve causal understanding as a result of doing it” (p. 377). Research styles, are, for Griesemer, “commitments to follow processes in a certain way.” Griesemer constructs the idea of genetics and embryology as nothing but research styles that “package commitments to follow processes according to particular sorts of marking interactions and tracking conventions together with commitments to represent processes in particular ways” (p. 381). In this view, the separation between genes and development ceases to be considered as an ontological divide: “It does not follow from the divergence of research styles and representational practices in genetics and embryology that nature is divided into separate processes of heredity and development” (p. 414). An important ingredient of Griesemer’s view is the use of representations with their dual course. Before being pressed into service as tools for communicating results and interpretations, representations are “working objects, developed as bench or field tools for tracking phenomena and following processes” (p. 388). Scientists, to be able to follow processes, produce representations that, in turn, “provide reinforcing feedback that organizes attention into foreground and background concerns” (p. 380). This dynamic becomes important when representations survive the experimental work in which they are produced and get used by other scientists. In scientific communities, process-marking and process-following strongly reinforce each other in an attention-guiding feedback, operated by representations. Griesemer analyzes Gregor Mendel’s experiments and describes Mendel—universally considered as the founding father of genetics—as a process follower and as a developmentalist. The different and successive notations appearing in Mendel’s writings (for example, A + 2Aa + a; then A + A + a + a) are the representations sequentially devised by Mendel in order to follow his enduring interest, that is, the developmental process of hybrids. Therefore, in this account, Mendel was a developmentalist who offered lasting representations that, in turn, helped some of his followers to focus on patterns of intergenerational transmission, backgrounding development. A particular power is given, in this account, to representations like Mendel’s notation: “In Mendel’s demonstration of notational equivalence, the possibility of reinterpreting his work on the development of hybrid characters in terms of a factor theory of hereditary transmission was so strong that it took very careful analysis by historians to show that Mendel probably did not hold the factor theory with which he is credited” (Griesemer 2007: 404). The consolidation of research styles directly concealed the awareness of their unity: “theories of heredity entail methodologies of development, and conversely” (p. 414); “genetics entails an idealized and abstracted account of development and development entails an idealized and abstract account of heredity” (p. 417); and “the gene theory not only had an embryological origin, it never really left embryology at all” (p. 414). An implication for the present and future of evo-devo is that putting heredity and development “back together again” can be thought of, in part, as a problem of conceptual reorientation, change in theoretical perspective, and rehabilitation of research styles that were out of the limelight rather than extinct due to failure. The commonly suggested linear progress from embryology to genetics to evo-devo is a historical artifact: there is no “historical progression of fields or lines of work that take the scientific limelight in turn” (p. 417).

Whether the described implications are historical or philosophical is difficult to discern, particularly in such cases as evo-devo, which are in current philosophical focus. It is more productive to say that Griesemer’s analysis shows the interplay between philosophy and history of biology. The view of scientists as “process-followers” can indeed be seen as a methodological and a philosophical proposal.

Philosophically, the view of scientists as process-followers is pretty well elaborated and detailed with the related notions of marking (mental and manipulative), foregrounding and backgrounding, research styles, and so on. Griesemer explicitly confronts his proposed view with more widespread approaches. For example:

The notion of following a process unifies [commonly separated] descriptions of science as theoretical representation, as systematic observation, and as technological intervention, [and] cuts across many analytical distinctions commonly used to describe science (e.g., theory vs. observation, theory vs. experiment, hypothesis-testing vs. measurement, active manipulation vs. passive observation, scientific methods vs. scientific goals). (p. 375)

The marking activity, in particular, “is not easily assigned to either of the traditional categories of passive observation and active experiment. It is nonmanipulative yet active work” (p. 379), and since such work allows to identify causality, theory, and methodology are intimately related. This local metatheorizing can be taken up by other philosophers and elaborated further.

Historians, too, are invited to test the view in describing other cases in the history of biology. To historians, however, there is also a reflexive message: just as scientists mark and follow processes in the systems they study, so do historians with the social and historical processes they follow. History and philosophy of science, in a word, would consist in a “following of scientists while they follow nature” (p. 376). This means that history and philosophy of science itself may be subject to research styles, and may need theoretical reorientations to gain a new understanding. In general, for example, since narratives tend to follow historical developments within scientific styles, history often gives a false impression of scientific disciplines (embryology and genetics, for example) that are separate because their theories describe different processes, like development and heredity. So historians and philosophers are invited to abandon “limelight narratives” that, while making “instructive drama,” confound our understanding of social processes. In the specific case of study:

Embryology is not well tracked in narratives that foreground the success of genetics after the split…. We must instead follow the ‘bushy’ divergences and reticulations of several sciences as they spawn new lines of work if we are to understand, and follow, science as a process. (p. 376, emphasis added)

8. Conclusion

We have seen that philosophy of biology can be actively involved in some scientific activities. When this is not the case, philosophy of biology is largely an interpretive description or re-description of instances of biology. Generalities about science in terms of general descriptions of science, biology, or biology’s sub-fields, as well as in terms of general philosophical problems about science, are usually the goals, sources, and backgrounds of philosophy of biology. At the same time, tentative generalities about science—such as the just seen view of “scientists as followers of processes”—can serve historical reconstructions and translate into methodological proposals for historians, too. However, the service is reciprocal, since present or past historical cases substantiate—if they don’t suggest—new philosophical views of science, which is a specific tendency of philosophy. The conclusion is that not only philosophy and science, but also history, form an entangled, integrated whole in current research, thought, and practice.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Cited Examples

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  • Wilson, David S. 1975. “A theory of group selection.” Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences USA 72(1): 143-146.
  • Wilson, Edward O. 1975. Sociobiology: The New Synthesis. Cambridge (MA): Harvard University Press.

b. Classics

i. First Generation

  • Beckner, Morton. 1959. The Biological Way of Thought. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Hull, David L. 1964. “The metaphysics of evolution.” British Journal for the History of Science 3: 309-337.
  • Hull, David L. 1969. “What philosophy of biology is not.” Synthese 20: 157-84.
  • Hull, David L. 1970. “Contemporary systematic philosophies.” Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics 1(1): 19-54.
  • Hull, David L. 1974. Philosophy of Biological Science. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Hull, David L. 1976. “Are species really individuals?” Systematic Biology 25(2): 174-191.
  • Grene, Marjorie G. 1959. “Two evolutionary theories, I–II.” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 9: 110–27; 185–93.
  • Grene, Marjorie G., and Everett Mendelsohn, eds. 1976. Topics in the Philosophy of Biology. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Schaffner, Kenneth F. 1967. “Approaches to reduction.” Philosophy of Science 34: 137-147.
  • Schaffner, Kenneth F. 1967. “Antireductionism and molecular biology.” Science 157: 644-647.
  • Ruse, Michael. 1973. The Philosophy of Biology. London:Hutchinson.
  • Wimsatt, William C. 1972. “Teleology and the logical structure of function statements.” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 3: 1-80.

ii. Second Generation

  • Amundson, Ron. 1988. “Logical adaptationism.” Behavioral and Brain Sciences 11: 505-506.
  • Amundson, Ron. 1989. “The trials and tribulations of selectionist explanations.” Issues in Evolutionary Epistemology. Eds. Hahlweg, Kai, and Clifford A. Hooker. State University of New York Press.
  • Beatty, John. 1980. “Optimal-design models and the strategy of model building in evolutionary biology.” Philosophy of Science 47: 532-561.
  • Beatty, John. 1982. “Classes and cladists.” Systematic Zoology 31: 25-34.
  • Brandon, Robert. 1990. Adaptation and Environment. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Burian, Richard M. 1988. “Challenges to the evolutionary synthesis.” Evolutionary Biology 23: 247-259.
  • Darden, Lindley. 1977. “William Bateson and the promise of Mendelism.” Journal of the History of Biology 10: 87-106.
  • Darden, Lindley. 1976. “Reasoning in scientific change: Charles Darwin, Hugo de Vries, and the discovery of segregation.” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 7: 127-169.
  • Depew, David, and Bruce H. Weber. 1985. Evolution at a Crossroads: The New Biology and the New Philosophy of Science. Cambridge MA: Bradford Books/MIT Press.
  • Depew, David, and Bruce H. Weber. 1995. Darwinism Evolving: Systems Dynamics and the Genealogy of Natural Selection. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books/MIT Press.
  • Dupré, John A. 1987. “Human kinds.”. The Latest on the Best. Ed. Dupré, John A. Bradford Books/MIT Press, pp. 327-348.
  • Gieryn, Thomas F. 1999. Cultural Boundaries of Science: Credibility on the Line. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Griesemer, James R. 1988. “Genes, memes and demes.” Biology and Philosophy 3:179-184.
  • Griesemer, James R., and Michael J. Wade. 1988. “Laboratory models, causal explanation and group selection.” Biology and Philosophy 3: 67-96.
  • Kitcher, Philip. 1981. “Explanatory unification.” Philosophy of Science 48: 507-531.
  • Kitcher, Philip. 1982. “Genes.” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 33: 337-359.
  • Kitcher, Philip. 1984. “Species.” Philosophy of Science 51: 308-333.
  • Lloyd, Elisabeth A. 1983. “The nature of Darwin’s support for the theory of natural selection.” Philosophy of Science 50: 112-129.
  • Lloyd, Elisabeth A. 1984. “A Semantic approach to the structure of population genetics.” Philosophy of Science 51: 242-264.
  • Lloyd, Elisabeth A. 1988. The Structure and Confirmation of Evolutionary Theory. Greenwood Press.
  • Mills, Susan K., and John Beatty. 1979. “The propensity interpretation of fitness.” Philosophy of Science 46: 263-286.
  • Rosenberg, Alexander. 1978. “The supervenience of biological concepts.” Philosophy of Science 45: 368-386.
  • Rosenberg, Alexander. 1982. “On the propensity definition of fitness.” Philosophy of Science 49: 268-273.
  • Sober, Elliott. 1983. “Parsimony in systematics: philosophical issues.” Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics 14(1): 335-357.
  • Sober, Elliott. 1983. “Equilibrium explanation.” Philosophical Studies 43: 201- 210.
  • Sober, Elliott. 1984. The Nature of Selection. Evolutionary Theory in Philosophical Focus. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Sober, Elliott. 1988. Reconstructing the Past: Parsimony, Evolution, and Inference. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Weber, Bruce H., James Smith, and David Depew. 1988. Entropy, Information, and Evolution: New Perspectives on Physical and Biological Evolution. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books/MIT Press.

c. Contemporary

i. Reviews

  • Byron, Jason M. 2007. “Whence philosophy of biology?” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 58(3): 409-422.
  • Callebaut, Werner. 2005. “Again, what the philosophy of biology is not.” Acta Biotheoretica 23: 93-122.
  • Griffiths, Paul E. 2011. “Philosophy of biology.” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2011 Edition). Ed. Zalta, Edward N.. URL = <>.
  • Hull, David L. 2002. “Recent philosophy of biology: a review.” Acta Biotheoretica 50: 117-128.
  • Gers, Matt. 2009. “The long reach of philosophy of biology.” Biology and Philosophy 26(3): 439-447.
  • Müller-Wille, Staffan. 2007. “Philosophy of biology beyond evolution.” Biological Theory 2(1): 111-112.
  • O’Malley, Maureen A., and John A. Dupré. 2007. “Size doesn’t matter: towards a more inclusive philosophy of biology.” Biology and Philosophy 22(2): 155-191.
  • Pradeu, Thomas. 2009. “What philosophy of biology should be.” Biology and Philosophy 26(1): 119-127.

ii. Some Monographs

  • Pigliucci, Massimo, and Jonathan Kaplan. 2006. Making Sense of Evolution. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Sober, Elliott. 2008. Evidence and Evolution: The Logic Behind the Science. Cambridge University Press.
  • Sober, Elliott, and David S. Wilson. 1998. Unto Others: the Evolution and Psychology of Unselfish Behavior. Cambridge (MA): Harvard University Press.

d. Anthologies and Textbooks

  • Ayala, Francisco, and Robert Arp, eds. 2009. Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Biology. Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Callebaut, Werner, ed. 1993. Taking the Naturalistic Turn: Or, How Real Philosophy of Science is Done. Chicago:University of Chicago Press.
  • Grene, Marjorie G., and David Depew. 2004. The Philosophy of Biology: An Episodic History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hull, David L., and Michael Ruse, eds. 1998. The Philosophy of Biology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hull, David L., and Michael Ruse, eds. 2007. The Cambridge Companion to the Philosophy of Biology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kampourakis, Kostas, ed. 2013. The Philosophy of Biology: A Companion for Educators. Springer Science & Business.
  • Linquist, Stefan, ed. 2010. Philosophy of Evolutionary Biology. Vol. 1. Berlington, VT: Ashgate.
  • Rosenberg, Alexander, and Robert Arp, eds. 2009. Philosophy of Biology: An Anthology. Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Rosenberg, Alexander, and Daniel W. McShea. 2008. Philosophy of Biology: A Contemporary Introduction. Routledge.
  • Ruse, Michael, ed. 1989. What the Philosophy of Biology is. Dordrecht, The Netherlands: Kluwer.
  • Ruse, Michael, ed. 2008. The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Biology. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Sarkar, Sahotra, and Anya Plutynski. 2008. A Companion to the Philosophy of Biology. Blackwell Publishing.
  • Sober, Elliott. 1993. Philosophy of Biology. Westview Press/Oxford University Press.
  • Sober, Elliott. 2006. Conceptual Issues in Evolutionary Biology. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Sterelny, Kim, and Paul E. Griffiths. 1999. Sex and Death: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Biology. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.

e. Journals

i. Dedicated

  • Acta Biotheoretica (since 1935)
  • History and Philosophy of the Life Sciences (since 1979)
  • Biology and Philosophy
  • Journal of the History of Biology
  • Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences Journal of the History of Biology
  • Biological Theory
  • Studies In History and Philosophy of Science Part A
  • Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B
  • Philosophy and Theory in Biology (since 2009)

ii. Generalist

  • Philosophy of Science
  • The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science
  • Foundations of Science
  • Metascience
  • Studies in History and Philosophy of Science

f. Organizations

  • International Society for the History, Philosophy, and Social Studies of Biology (
  • Philosophy of Science Association (PSA) (
  • Society for Philosophy of Science in Practice (SPSP) (
  • Inter-Divisional Teaching Commission (IDTC) of the International Union for the History and Philosophy of Science (IUHPS):

g. Online Resources

  • T. Lewens, “The philosophy of biology: a selection of readings and resources” page at the University of Cambridge:

Author Information

Emanuele Serrelli
University of Milano-Bicocca