Maurice Blondel (1861—1949)
Table of Contents
- Immanence and Transcendence
- L’Action (1893)
- The Reaction to L’Action and the Dialectic Between Philosophy and Christianity
- Blondel’s Metaphysical Trilogy
- Blondel’s Methodology
- References and Further Reading
Maurice Blondel was born in Dijon, France in 1861, entered the École Normale Supérieure in 1881, and passed the aggregation in 1886. Like many in his generation, he was profoundly affected by the tensions in French life, particularly those between the French academic establishment and Catholicism. Blondel defended his thesis, L’action in 1893, at the Sorbonne. His thesis, which argues for the inescapability of the “religious problem”, brought him into the heart of theological and philosophical controversy of his time, First, Blondel was refused an university position on the grounds of having taken an improperly religious position in his philosophy, finally receiving a Professorship in Aix in 1897. After his difficulties with the philosophers, Blondel found himself under attack by conservative neo-thomist theologians for having rationalized theology, and ultimately by the group L’Action Francaise, as a “modernist”. Blondel wrote the Letter on Apologetics in 1896 and History and Dogma in 1903 precisely to address these problems, not least the great gap between Catholic thought and Modern philosophy and social existence.
Blondel refused to republish L’action (1893), intending to rework it in light of a larger, more rigorous project that was to become his metaphysical trilogy. In the meantime, he published numerous articles upon Modern Philosophy and Church Fathers, and took part in the Modernist controversy, taking a position that was neither Modernist nor Veterist, but rather stressed the role of a living tradition. In 1905, Blondel purchased the journal Annales de la Philosophie Chrétienne, and set up Lucien Laberthonière as editor, and engaged himself in argument against L’Action Francaise and its authors. In 1919, Blondel’s wife, Rose, died, and in 1927, his vision degenerated, leaving him nearly blind, necessitating his retirement, able to work only by dictation. From 1934 to 1937, however, he published the five volumes, La Pensée (2 vol.), L’être et les êtres, and L’action (2 vol.) of the metaphysical trilogy, followed by L’Esprit chrétien, only two volumes of which were completely finished at his death in 1949.
Blondel’s importance has largely been in theological and Catholic philosophical circles in France, Germany, Spain, Italy, and Quebec. Among many other important authors in the 20th Century, Blondel is responsible for the “new theology”, that played such a great role in the deliberations and arguments of the Second Vatican Council.
Perhaps the most central theme in Blondel’s work is the complex relationship between immanence and transcendence. For each order of phenomena, it is possible to carry out an analysis simply at the level of those phenomena or in terms of those phenomena, within certain limits. Such an analysis, while revealing the relative sufficiency and structures of one level, for instance, those of affectivity and the body on the one hand, or of political association, on the other, has as its goal the indication at what points at to what degree these levels are not self-sufficient and must make recourse, either overtly or covertly to something transcendent to that level and order, for example, intentional and voluntary action as transcendent to affectivity, or humanity and morality as transcendent to political association. This type of analysis does not nullify the reality of the phenomena treated as immanent, but rather exhibits their necessary co-structuring relationship with the orders of phenomena transcendent to them.
This relationship is often figured in terms of adequacy and self-sufficiency. The goal of Blondel’s analyses is to show that the order of phenomena treated as immanent from within the scope of that particular investigation is not sufficient unto itself, that is, that at least another order of phenomena, an order transcendent to the order under investigation. Philosophical, religious, and scientific doctrines function, never simply as representations of reality, simply within the range of speculation or theory, but also serve to orient the life, practices, and action of human subjects, and it is in this respect that adequacy as a criterion comes into play. A doctrine about the reality in which human beings live which does not sufficiently take into account and provide a reflective basis for action, by which a subject can come to understand their role and destiny within that life, a life shared by others, mediated historically and materially, and ultimately oriented towards transcendence, cannot but prove to be inadequate to the demands of the problem of action.
In this perspective then, the goal of Blondel’s life-work was three-fold: First, to examine the exigencies of human action in order to delineate the too-often neglected structures of this vital dimension of human existence. Second, to examine the doctrines of thinkers, texts, and movements, in order to assess the adequacy of their positions and to expose the inadequacies of their positions and practices. What Blondel carried out in his own time is what has come to be called, in certain circles, as set of “philosophical interventions”; Finally, the development of a more fully articulated “philosophy of insufficiency”, which would comprehensively treat the relationship of action to thought and being for the human subject oriented historically, socially, and in relation to the Absolute.
L’Action: essai d’une critique de la vie et d’une science de la pratique, with minor adjustments, is the thesis defended by Blondel at the Sorbonne at. This work, despite its very early position in Blondel’s corpus, is perhaps the best known of his works. While not as comprehensive as his later works, many of the themes that dominate his work are treated in L’action, and for this reason, this article gives the greatest space to a summary of these themes as found in that work. The text consists of five main sections, developing a dialectical phenomenology and ontology of the subject of action and its relation to transcendence. Blondel begins, in the Introduction, by delineating the relationship between speculation and action, and by arguing the impossibility of a purely speculative resolution or even setting of the problem action poses
The human condition is of the necessity to act, without ever having the luxury of taking a purely speculative position prior to involvement.
Impossibility of abstaining or of holding myself back, an incapacity to satisfy myself, to suffice to myself, and to be free of myself, this is what a first glance at my condition reveals to me. (p.x)
At the same time, this condition of already being enmired in the situation of action, action one has already taken, and action one is yet to take, provides the subject with the possibility of knowledge about the conditions and determinations of action, both a type of self-knowledge, and a knowledge of reality. Commitment, therefore, does not preclude speculative objectivity, rather it is its condition of possibility.
I will not claim to know myself and to experience myself, to acquire certainty, nor to assess the destiny of Man, without placing all of Man that I carry in myself into the crucible. It is a living laboratory, this organism of flesh, appetites, desires, and thoughts whose obscure labor I feel perpetually. (p.xii).
In fact, Blondel will go so far as to demand that the understanding of action must be brought to the point of a “science”, a science, however, which, must go beyond the limitations of the conception of science as simply objective. What Blondel means by science in this context is similar to what Hegel means by science in his discussions in the Phenomenology of Spirit and the Science of Logic. This science is particularized as well in the knowing and acting subject.
It is therefore a science of action that we must constitute; a science that will only be such to the degree that it is total, because every way of thinking and living deliberately implies a complete solution to the problem of existence. (p. xvii)
Blondel focuses his investigation upon action precisely because this is the only way to call everything into question, to proceed without relying completely on any presuppositions or predeterminations. This, however, leads him to a central concept and experience, that of a will (volonté), at the very center, the “common knot of science, morals, and metaphysics”, of his being.
At the ground of my being, there is a willing and a loving of being, or there is nothing . . . Involuntary and constrained being would no longer be: so much it is true that the last word of everything is beneficence; and to be is to will and to love. (p. xxiii)
In the first part, Blondel asks whether the problem of action is necessary to pose in the first place, or whether it can be avoided. By the problem of action, Blondel means the problem of the determination of the subject morally by some degree of reflection and engagement within being. It is not possible to suppress or banish this problem entirely by denying the possibility or reality of moral action, nor to, in appearance going one step further, deny any possibility of an adequate knowledge of being, in the first place because these attempts to deny the ground of the problem must still make some claim to a basis in truth and a relation to value.
In order to suppress everything, it is necessary, and it suffices, as it appears, to be all science, all sensation, and all action. (p.2)
This is a theme which appears over and over in Blondel’s works. Such negative and ultimately idealistic attempts to banish the problem indicate a deep form of egoism, a taking of self as the ultimately valuable and real, and an attempt, at the same time to remove any constraints upon the pure freedom of the self. This takes place though an attempt to conceal this position of a will, not only to power, but for the preservation of the conditions of employing that power, by means of a scepticism or nihilism that ostensibly denies the reality of values, an treats being as appearance. What this position truly maintains, however, is the will willing its own freedom, a type of freedom, however, unconditioned by any object but the self.
And, “I do not will to will”, nolo velle, translates immediately in the language of reflection into the two words, volo nolle, “I will not to will”. At least to do violence to the laws of conscience, not moral, but psychological, at least to dissimulate, under a completely verbal subtlety, to truth of things, the single sentiment of an absence of will implies the idea of a will that does not will and abdicates. (p. 12)
No denial of the problem, therefore, can sustain itself, not simply because it is false, but because it relies secretly upon that which it would refuse to affirm. In the second part, Blondel asks whether, given that the problem of action in unavoidable, one can consistently take a negative solution to it, the solution of pessimism or of a tragic sensibility. This position is not without a certain ground in truth, for our experience of life is not one of simple harmony, but one of discord, of suffering, of the presence of evil. It does not suffice for us to will the good for the good to be produced, or even for our wills to remain constant. The experience at the ground of pessimism is one of futility and the vanity of our attempts to come to terms with reality. Blondel views this problematic as especially acute in modern times, promoted by the artificial modes of thought of Kantian Critical Philosophy
Under the pretext of raising back up and of strengthening perhaps practical reason, one ruined it by the same stroke that strikes a deadly blow to pure reason. For all, whether they know or not, the problem of life is at the same time a question of metaphysics, or morals, and of science: action is that synthesis of willing, of knowing, and of being, the link of the human composite that one cannot separate without destroying everything that has been deunited.
The modern forms of pessimism result, in part, from the dominance of a mode of thought that, driven by epistemological concerns, imposes these ultimately false separations, both methodologically, as in the sciences, and more generally in the conditions of public life. If the possibility of a coherent totality of willing, knowing and being, is denied, these fall apart into orders of mere positivities whose ultimate meaning cannot be grasped. Indeed, pessimism is the very denial of such a meaning.
Again, Blondel finds in pessimism a hidden movement and directedness of the will. The pessimist cannot be satisfied with life because he postulates some greater value, unsatisfied in that life, namely the fullness of being, not merely the phenomenon.
From the phenomenon, he argues against being, even though he only feels the insufficiency of the phenomenon if it is penetrated first by the grandeur of being: he affirms before denying it and in order to deny it. (p. 33)
At the moment when one declares the insufficiency of the phenomenon, one attaches oneself to it as if it were the only real and solid being; one persists in contenting oneself with what thought and desire recognize to be vain, deceptive, and nul; one places one’s whole where one admits otherwise that there is nothing. (p. 35)
The third part of L’action, divided into five sections, takes up the task of delineating a positive solution to the problem of action, by means of generating and applying the “Science of action” Blondel spoke of earlier. Blondel argues that one cannot restrict the phenomenon of action or the science which would study it to a purely natural order, least of all that of the “natural sciences” developed in Modernity. In the first section, beginning with an analysis of sensation, the incapacity for the natural sciences to deal effectively with sensation as actually sensed, that is, buy a subject, and not treated merely as an objective fact, leads Blondel into a distinction between two different but auto-reinforcing fields of “science”, namely deductive science and positive or empirical science. Both of these types of science, which remain incapable of treating subjectivity as such, are justified by a covert appeal to each other, explaining the dominance of the scientific viewpoint in Modernity.
In order to effectively study action, a subjective science is necessary, a science that finds its basis in the very phenomenon of subjectivity
That is to say that in every scientific truth and in every known reality we must suppose, in order that it be known, an internal principle of unity, a center of grouping imperceptible to the senses or to the mathematical imagination, an operation immanent to the diversity of the parts, an organic idea, an original action which escapes from positive knowledge at the moment when it makes it possible, and to employ a word which needs to be better defined, a subjectivity (p. 87)
In the second section, Blondel begins to work out this science of subjectivity, beginning at the level of the threshold of consciousness and the affective and sensual structures of the body. In his investigation of the determinations of these basic components of consciousness, Blondel rejects any reduction to formal-mechanistic conceptions of determination, namely mechanistic determinism. At first this takes place in terms of a mere psychological spontaneity.
So, from the moment where it appears under the form of appetite or of instinctual need, there is a spontaneity victorious over mechanist determinism, an automatism already completely psychological. (p. 103)
The psychological determinism absorbs and puts to use the physical determinism, and will, in its turn be likewise set upon by higher levels of human existence, mediated in great part by symbolic activity. Symbolic activity is the original basis of both the intellect and the will, of intentional action and of reflection. The categories by which action and thought become possible remain imbued, but no longer determined by, affectivity and sensation, and enter into and generate further complex orders of their own which, although they are distinguishable from the lower orders, maintain a continuity with them as well.
It is from this basis that the human being becomes conscious, no merely of urges and desires or capacities, but also of freedom as such and of more than fleeting self-consciousness. In fact, the two, while not identical, are inextricable. Reflection guides action, and action demands reflection, both of these taking place through the subject which is never completely either one or the other. It is also at this level where transcendence can begin to be grasped reflectively, as further determination with respect to the immanent and not merely the negation of the immanent. For the subject, this takes place in relation to the infinite, and an infinite which one comes to know imperfectly through action.
What is it in effect that reveals to consciousness that apparent infinity of a power which is that agent’s? It is the very action which accomplishes itself in it and by it. And what inspires for it the desire and the feeling of its own power? It is the idea of that infinity of action from which it makes the origin of its voluntary decisions: a reflection and freedom impossible for whoever instead of acting would be acted upon. For there is no reason or reflective consciousness or sentiment of infinity except where there is consciousness of acting. (p.120)
Action then, reposing originally upon a ground of passivity, of being acted upon by the world and others, is a transcendence of that passivity. In turn, however, that means that the process of the determination of that activity, that transcendence will be a process that is in fact in process, that cannot be simply reduced again to another immanent order, especially an order represented as purely immanent, for that would involve us again in the problem of a subjectivity which does not take account at all, as was the case in modern science, of its continual, complex, and irreducible role in orders of objectivity.
The freedom of the will and the capacity for reflection, for rationality, cannot be maintained as purified, however, as they were for Kant, for the attempt to guarantee autonomy of the will as a condition for moral action ignore the requirement of commitment, of a necessary degree of heteronomy. In order to act in a world which is not simply dominated by the subject, the subject must allow its action to de determined in part by the exigencies of the situation. A certain heteronomy is therefore the condition for the possibility of autonomy.
Submitting itself to a heteronomy in order to maintain its own sovereignty, it brings to the service of a chosen tendency the very forces of the rival tendencies; it does what it does with the power that it would have used to do everything that it does not do. (p.130)
Action is a sort of co-action, not simply the imposition of force externally, but a relation to what one wills to act upon and with. Blondel makes a distinction between the willing will (volonté voulante) and the willed will (volonté voulue) which are both aspects of this play between autonomy and heteronomy in co-action.
This is why, proposing to itself freedom as an end, one feels a disproportion between the willing will, quod procedit ex volontate, and the willed will, quod volontatis objectum fit. One experiences the difficulty of a choice and a sacrifice.(p. 132)
In the three sections that follow, Blondel carries out a set of analyses, moving from the body of the subject to the relationship between the individual and society, and finally from the social to the religious in a general sense, the “superstitious”. The general movement in each case follows the same structure: an analysis of the order of immanence indicates the insufficiency of that order to the phenomena that are uncovered in that analysis, pointing to the necessity of something transcendent to and contributing to the structure of meaning of the immanent order. That transcendent then is explored from the new vantage point of that order of phenomena, and reveals in its turn its own insufficiencies and exigencies.
Beginning with the body, Blondel exposes the relationship between conscious life and the unconscious, which has its own role in action. The very irreducibility of action to a verbal or conceptual formalization derives from the fact that our existence as conscious and self-conscious beings is mediated by the unconscious, that which is, as determinations of agents, without being explicitly known by those agents.
The unconscious is not down below only; it is also up above and beyond deliberate resolutions. (p.150)
Consciousness is not something which sorts out the vagaries of the unconscious or operates upon it afterward; rather it is a node of clarity and lucidity which is at the same time, a shifting off into regions of shadow. Blondel asks why the will has to incarnate itself in materiality. The answer to this is not simply a matter of the interaction between formal and material causes, so that in order to have a form, there must be a matter in which the form resides. Nor, in a variation on this, is it simply a matter of efficient causality, so that the essence of the will be that it act upon and through the body. Instead, there is a relationship of final causality which includes these others but surpasses them. For, more is gained by the will than simply the locus of its externalization in its incarnation, precisely because the will is something which takes place temporally. The will allows itself to be worked upon, to be unfolded, to blossom open, only though its thoroughgoing ebb and flow into and out of materiality. Hence, in order for the will to be, not simply what it wills, but what it will be, what it would be, that is, for it to move towards its final end, it must allow this incorporation and materialization in the body.
This means that the will has to incorporate itself in habitual processes, where there is an interplay between the conscious and the unconscious. The permeability of the conscious and the unconscious to each other is what allows them to interact.
Thus the prealable notion of effort is like the structure prepared to receive all of the precise lessons of effective experience. What is afferent in real perception is not perceived as such except as the consequece of a yet undetermined initiative and because of the a priori welcome of the expected a posteriori. (p.156)
This very complex process cannot be taken in by consciousness as a whole without the aid of adumbration and imagery. At the same time, however, the very passivity and habitude which is required for the effectuation of the will is at the same time a product of previous willings mediated through previous states of materiality.
The habitual comportments, modified by the conscious interventions of the will and reflection, are not merely the relationship of a subject to a set of objects. Rather, at this basic level, the relationships to objects are already invested with a degree of subjectivity that is not merely a projection on the part of the acting subject. To the degree that the forces which resist the willing will and thus condition the willed will are not simply physical factors of an order completely heterogenous to the will, they take on a partially subjective nature.
But, the forces that are not a pure inertia, nor a brutal and blind weight; the multiple forces that express themselves in us by an instinctive tendency toward ends in view, by appetites, by solicitations that hold our thought, of forces that, in a word, reveal, below reflection, a subjective life and the intervention of obscure consciousnesses. (p.162)
These forces, within the willing subject are partially dominated by reason and the will, but a reversal of this is possible as well, where the subject comes to be dominated by these impulsions of forces. In fact, this is quite reflective of Blondel’s position. These motifs can come to dominate the reasonable willing subject precisely because they play a necessary role in action. Rational and voluntary action is then never pure, it always requires a co-action and synergy.
This co-action becomes much more explicit in the domain of the social. The possibility of action does not lie simply in the relation of the individual to the world, but is rather already permeated by sociality, not least in so far as action is brought into reflective thought by instances of conceptualization and language, but also by a categorical exigency of intersubjectivity.
Just as the formulated liberty could not save its autonomy except by imposing on itself the heteronomy of a practical obligation and an effort, the person is not born in the individual, it does not constitute and conserve itself except by assigning itself an impersonal end . . .Man does not suffice to himself; he must act for others, with others, by others. One cannot arrange for onself the affairs of one’s own life. Our existences are so connected that it is impossible the conceive a single action that does not extend in infinite undulations, quite beyond the end that it seemed to aim at. (p.198)
The condition for all but the most primitive and basic types of action is that one act within a social world, which means not simply a world of others, but a world in which others act, have acted, and will act. In the fourth section, Blondel turns his attention explicitly to the conditions of the intelligibility of acts, and this implies a necessary mediation by signification, signs, and language. In its most fundamental form, this co-implication of self and other takes place in terms of giving aid, of helping, prior to all strive and contention, which, however, are also then possibilities of the acting subject in relation to other subjects.
The fact of such an intricate relationship between action and signification, however, also means that the expressivity of the act does not remain with the subject, but is in a certain sense, just as much as a word or a gesture, alienated from the originating subject. Any other subject might be the one to perceive and interpret, give a meaning to the action, and this is a condition for the ac even in the process of origination, which makes all action, in a certain sense universal. Significative action, however, is not simply representation, but is also productive.
One should not believe that, in the sign, there is nothing more than its weakened echo: no, there is, already in it, in order to make it possible and to produce it, a commerce of the agent with something other than the agent, a new synthesis of the individual life with the milieu where it deploys itself. So, one does not speak in the void; and it is a foreign concourse a parte acti, which permits the most rudimentary expansion a parte agentis. Every sign is already a work. (p. 208)
This does not mean, however, that action is always successful, always aided by those brought into it through their own contribution to the act. Working along with each other means that the guidance and direction of the action is also alienable.
The impenetrability, the insufficiency, the unintelligence of our allies mess up our projects just as much as the hostility of obstacles: They make theirs what we want to be our own. (p. 217)
This, however, is never an all-or-nothing determination. Implicitly, all involved in an action play some role in its determination.
So the causal link results at the same time from a subjective disposition and an emperical association. Its originality is at the same time analytic a priori and synthetic a posteriori; for, in the effect produced, each of the subjects who contributes is a principal agent. The ideal intention seems completely drawn from the initiator; the response appears to come entirely from the collaborator; but, in fact, there is a reciprocity of the forma and the matter, and in the work, there is a symmetrical operation: each thinks to have done everything. (p. 223)
In the arrangements of social relations, a level transcendent to the individual subject, this becomes explicit. And, with this movement to the level of the social, Blondel treats another order of immanence, one where the existence and agency of individuals is no longer oriented around the subject alone.
That there are subjects foreign to the agent, this is a phenomenon of the same order as the existence of the subject himself (p. 225)
Blondel elaborates the structures of social organization in the fifth part of the third section. He does not assume a single basis for society. There are different levels, all of which interpenetrate each other and contribute to determination of each other, but within which there exists a certain order irreducible to but affected by the other orders.
These societies, more or less comprehensive, are in effect defined and limited, just as every organism is. They form a collective individuality, and bear, like a living being, a proper name: the family, the homeland, humanity. But, at the same time that they are circumscribed and as it were boxed-up in each other, they remain open. (p.246)
These different levels of social organization, however, can fall into difficulties and idolatries analogous to those that can bedevil the individual. Often the capacity for healthy and salutary social involvement exists only in potentia, in actu at the level of the individuals only, not at the level of society. Blondel devotes analyses to each of the levels. At the level of the family, a mutual commitment, rooted in but not reducible to organic processes, conditioned but not entirely determined by the culture of the homeland, results in the generation of a new generation, maintaining a certain identity through difference. More complex and serving different ends than the family alone is the homeland, the patrie, the nation, where a common culture is shared, the mode of life is differentiated, and a continuity beyond that of blood-relations is preserved.
Blondel is quite conscious of the dangers that a Romantic conception of the nation as Volk promotes. He raises two very important requirements for a nation to be more than simply an ideological construct which conceals structures of domination. First, there must be equitable relations of production between the classes and groups comprising the society. Second, there must be a reflective and free social discourse.
Not that the historical development of nations and races accomplishes itself with the infallible spontaneity of instinct. It is not at all a matter of that confused life that vegetates in the heart of popular masses. Human history is not, in the strict sens of the word, natural history. That is to say, beyond the indistinct forces which move the great human currents, reflection and liberty are original powers, capable of penetrating profoundly, as essential factors, into the destiny of peoples. (p. 266)
In fact, this requirement for the social to be conditioned by reflection and freedom, the province of the will and reason means that the homeland, the nation is revealed as insufficient to itself. To the degree that universal ideas are appealed to and promoted, the nation is no longer able to close itself off and treat others as mere tools or slaves. The higher developments of national consciousness, for Blondel, introduce the development of consciousness of humanity as such.
The universalization of morality that this movement introduces the role of morality as more than simply a set of customs or an ethos. The acting agent, acting within a social milieu which is, most often, quite flawed and wracked by conflicts, injustices, violence, remains capable of, even called to, action that can promote the good, both social and individual. Morality, is not, however, as it was for Kant, the universal precepts of a reason legislating for itself and for all rational beings. Instead, more comprehensively, it consists in the relations of social and moral solidarity with the actions, many of them past, the actions of those who are already themselves dead. Morality is something which exceeds the moral agent not because the moral agent is not rational enough, but because morality is something which, properly speaking, takes place within, but is not reduced to or absolutely determined by society.
Morals are not simple individual habits generalized. If there is an action of the individual on society, and of society on the individual, we must above all take account of the influence of society on society itself. That is to say that morals create morals; that a social fact derives from other social and collective facts where the sentiment has a greater part than the clear idea; and that individual action cannot suffice to organize the life of the individual, because there always is in practical logic more than the abstract analysis could discover. (p.284)
Morality, however, and the possibility of moral action, leads to another level of transcendence. It is impossible to account fully for morality by reference to a purely secular order of phenomena, and the demythologised accounts of Enlightenment philosophy remain unable to account for it as well. There is a dimension which Blondel calls the “superstitious” that supports value and morality and provides it with an end and structure of motivations as well. Even in the appeal to a demythologized or disenchanted social world, this functions as a new type of myth, the myth of having and appealing to no myths. This means that the social order, transcendent to the individual subject, cannot be wholly self-sufficient as well, not even when expanded to a generalized humanity. One must take account of the role of the supernatural, not merely in its role in the origins of primitive cultures, but within all cultures.
In the fourth part, Blondel, having elaborated the dialectical relationships between the various orders of immanence and transcendence, Blondel returns to the problem of action from considerations of the single acting subject. In the first moment, the will is revealed as inadequate to the action it aims to impose on phenomena; something always escapes it in its striving towards a goal. Second, willing action not only fails to produce entirely what it wills, it produces what it does not will, unforseen consequences; the will remains, itself one of these unforseen consequences, and this means responsibility cannot be easily evaded. Both of these moments lead to the point of realization that human action implies an “inevitable transcendence”, eventually leading the agent towards the “one thing necessary”, the necessary being, God, who we, however, are not able to figure and dominate by concepts or phenomena.
The part culminates in a radical determination of the acting individual subject in relation to the structures that have been uncovered and explored throughout the work, and in particular to the transcendent moment of unity, Religion and God. Blondel calls this moment “the option”. This does not correspond to a voluntarist determination of either absolute obedience to a divine being whose reasons one cannot question or to non-obedience, but rather to the possibility of an ascesis of the will and a recognition of one’s insufficiency. The other pole of the option is selfishness (egoisme), a decision taken against this insufficiency, to, in one permutation or another, will onself as the center of being, remaining, to be sure, inadequate to this position, but also concealing this from onself. This latter Blondel calls “the death of action” , counterpoised to the “life of action”, in which one wills to take part in an economy of grace, to recognize not only one’s finitude, but also the infinitude of the Absolute that is related to the finite personally.
Mortification is therefore the true metaphysical experiment, that which bears on being itself. What dies is that which impedes seeing, doing, living; and what survives is already that which is reborn. To survive oneself, there is the proof of the good will. The be dead would not be anything, but to survive, to feel oneself stripped of one’s intimate complacencies and of one’s tastes of independence, to be in the world as not being in it, to find for all human tasks more ardor in detachment than one can force in passion, this is the masterpiece of man. (383-4)
In the final part of L’action, Blondel turns explicitly to the relationship between philosophy and Christianity, the natural and the supernatural. He rejects the argument that anything supernatural must be, from a human perspective, arbitrary, since humans are not simply, as his studies of action have shown, confined merely to the immanent and natural orders. Blondel attacks the sterility of critical philosophy, the apogee of the Enlightenment, for having closed off questions rather than answering them, for demanding God to show Himself and to be judged by man. Blondel locates the fundamental error in the lack of attention to the phenomenon of action. Too often philosophy treats action as something only secondary, thinking that the limited intelligible structures philosophy treats are reality itself. Instead, action plays a fundamental mediatory role, it allows the “conditions of possibility” to be such, and to be manifested as such.
Blondel draws as a corollary the necessity for literal and actual lived practice in order to tackle the religious problem, which has important implications for philosophical practice
Without false respect or temerity, it is fitting to bring philosophy to the point where it can go, to the point that it ought to go. It has too often abandoned a part, the highest, of its domain; we ought to give it back to it. . . . It is a matter of seeing how this notion of the supernatural is necessarily engendered, and how the supernatural seems necessary to the human will in order that action be equated in consciousness. (406)
Blondel brings the work to a close by discussing corollaries to this, particularly the concrete and particular exigencies of such a practical grounding. This does not imply any sort of particularity one wishes to take; rather, to respond fully to the problem of action and the religious problem is already to be centered in a history mediated by certain texts and practices. At the same time, this also involves the acting subject in the most general determination, those of thought and of being, and these are structured dialectically, by a “logic” that does not allow itself to be subsumed simply to thought, or, as it did for Hegel, to the relationship between thought and being. The attempt to resolve the problem of action and the religious problem thus finds itself brought back finally to the problem of the end of human destiny
The Critique of Life, in order to resolve the human problem, can not not resolve the universal problem. It determines the common knot of science, or morals, and of metaphysics. It fixes the relations of consciousness and reality. It defines the meaning of being. This vital point it discovers at the intersection of knowing and of willing, in action (480)
Blondel came under attack from both sides after the defense of his thesis, first from the philosophical establishment, second from right-wing Catholic critics. It is in response to this second set of critics that Blondel wrote Letter on Apologetics and History and Dogma, two works which treat the relationship between Catholic dogma, the historical role of the Church, Modern Philosophy, and Modernity. These pieces allowed Blondel to clarify his position on the concrete exigencies of the historical relationship between the Catholic Church and the subject acting within a world which had changed drastically since the Middle Ages, a subject confronted not least with the increasingly marginalized role of the Church in politics, economics, science, and philosophy.
In the Letter on Apologetics, Blondel calls the Thomist-Scholastic synthesis, at its time an apogee of reflective and concrete thought engaged in social, intellectual, and religious problems, an “unstable equilibrium”, one which cannot be returned to or reimposed by fiat, but which must be replaced by a renewed consideration of the general conditions such a equilibrium was an attempt to reconcile and resolve. Blondel locates this in the capacity for the Thomistic synthesis to mediate the two conflicting realms of philosophy and theology by providing a third term, a mediating ground and link. This capacity, however, was a transitory one, lost in the immense changes that took place in Modernity, and Blondel calls for the restoration, through rigorous examination of the demands, motifs, and systematic claims of modern thought, of such a mediating term.
The central problematic, as Blondel views it, is one of conflicting requirements of autonomy and heteronomy. Philosophy, since it emancipated itself from theological concerns, in order to be what it ought to be, must be acknowledged as autonomous, while theology, by its very nature, cannot be theology under such conditions; while requiring use of the intellect and will, it ultimately can only take place in a fundamental heteronomy.
. . . the chief and indeed the unique aim of philosophy is to assure the full liberty of the mind, to guarantee the autonomous life of thought, and to determine in complete independence the conditions which establish its sway. Can there be, then, any possible connection between philosophy and Christianity, since the one seems to exclude the other. (152)
Blondel aims to undermine this false dichotomy in the Letter in two main ways. First, he addresses the question of the necessity of Christianity.
If Christianity were a belief and a way of life added to our nature and our reason as something optional, if we could develop in our integrity without this addition and we could refuse deliberately and with impunity the crushing weight of the supernatural gift, there would be no intelligible connection between these two levels, one of which, from the rational point of view might well not exist. (154-5)
Blondel argues that assuming such an optional status for Christianity, not optional in the sense of being merely a possible choice of the individual subject, but optional in the sense of being ultimately superfluous to rigorous philosophical reflection, is precisely to miss addressing the problem Christianity poses; ultimately, it is a question of “all or nothing”. One can reject the philosophical viewpoints that Christianity nurtures, one can decide a priori that there is no relevance or veracity to such a comportment or hypothesis, but this is not a neutral decision.
Second, Blondel argues that a dialectical engagement between Christianity, in particular Catholicism, and Modern philosophy has become necessary for either of these to remain consistent to themselves and their very projects. On the part of Christianity, if it is to retain a faithful orientation to Christ as Truth, it cannot afford to disregard the thought developed since the apogee of the Scholasticism, as was too often the case in Catholic circles. Nor could it afford to uncritically accept premises from current thought, too often the case in Protestant circles. For philosophy, the question is one of realizing the limits to its competence, not simply by laying down boundaries in the fashion Kant followed, through an intellectual division of labor that subordinated all other disciplines to philosophy; rather, philosophy, in order to remain true to itself, must come to recognize the competencies of other disciplines, and the exigencies of the supernatural, as the criteria for its limits.
Philosophy, in fine, giving up the pretension of containing and controlling totum et omne de omni et toto and the contrary but correlative pretension which makes it only a construction of thought or an epiphenomenon on the surface of life, must now precisely define its own competence and scope, including its own dynamism in the whole system of determination which it studies. (180)
Such a philosophy, which Blondel alternately calls a “Christian philosophy” or an “integral philosophy”, would in fact be the mediating third term discussed above, and is, Blondel maintains, the “subjective science” developed in his work L’action. This integral philosophy would not aim to replace all other systems, whether philosophical or theological, or to subordinate them, but rather to provide the supplement that they in fact require in order to fulfil their functions properly, including refraining from abrogating to themselves privileges, responsibilities, and authority which not only they do not rightly possess, but also interfere with their functioning and self-regulation and critique. Blondel’s critique, therefore, is also positive in that it not only manifest dialectically the limits and relations between philosophy and Christianity, but also constitutes precisely the theory and practice that maintains this reflection.
In History and Dogma, Blondel returns to these problems in a more historically motivated fashion. In the Letter on Apolgetics, he argued that there was a historical progress in the emancipation and subsequent development of Modern thought, not progress simpliciter, however, but rather a condition for progress, a condition that would be satisfied only in the evaluation, critique, and reappropriation of Modern thought by the integral philosophy he elaborated. Blondel also maintained that the proper attitude for the Catholic Church to take in the face of the effects, and even dominance, of Modern thought in recent time was not one of retrenchment, or return to an idealized Middle Ages dominated by Thomism, in part because of the progress to be realized through the confrontation with Modern thought, but also in greater part because there is no humanly historical origin-point to be returned to, which means that those advocating such a return are in effect covertly relying upon a form of idealism. In History and Dogma, Blondel takes up this problem more explicitly, arguing for a middle position between and critical of historicism and extrinsicism.
The question in particular was to the status of Christian dogma and its relationship to historical developments. One view, extrinsicism, held that dogma was unchanging, that it provided the meaning to historical events and developments, and that therefore the problems posed by the development of dogma in human history simply reflected errors. The static position taken by extrinsicism was motivated in part by the excesses of historicism, which argues that since dogmas arise historically, they are merely contingent products of historical processes. Within Catholic circles, such historicism took the form of Modernism, which, among other things, advocated accommodating dogma to Modern thought, precisely by using the categories and systems of Modern thought as the criteria for such accommodation.
Blondel rejects the explicit and systematic claims of both sides in the dispute, but offers a solution that allows a more fertile relationship between history and dogma. Dogma does in fact develop historically, and it is the product of historical process that are to a great degree contingent; in fact, going even further, in order for Dogma not to be simply another form of idealism, the believer must acknowledge that it is never present in absolutely completed form as extrinsicism maintains. Since Dogma purports to refer to reality, as part of that reality changes though the momentous changes of History, Dogma must be open to reinterpretation in light of, but not simply in terms of, present situations. In fact, living tradition allows for such a dialectic between past and present without requiring one to be absolutely subsumed to the other. On the other hand, the relativist claims of historicism are not even coherent, when they are taken to their logical conclusions. While the direction and thematics of history cannot be determined a priori (one of the conditions of it even being historical development), this does not mean that there are not some central processes and events that are more important than others and which play a much greater determinative role. In addition, for Blondel, history itself poses the religious problems that the dogma of Christianity represent solutions to.
Blondel’s emphasis upon tradition reflects his very methodology. Tradition is to function a a guide to the interpretation of the relationship between dogma and history, but this tradition itself, if it is not to falter and slip into one extreme or the other, must be a living and vital tradition. This means that it must remain engaged with the developments of the world outside of that tradition while at the same time remaining engaged within in a continuing conversation with the luminaries and decisive agents of its past. In the case of Catholicism, as Blondel argues both against the conservative Catholics of his time and against the Modern thinkers hostile to religion in general, let alone to Christianity or Catholicism, the very nature of the tradition requires a reflective and assiduously maintained commitment to fidelity to keeping that a living tradition.
In his later years, Blondel returned to the themes of L’action (1893), this time as a moment in a much more explicitly worked out metaphysical trilogy, La Pensée (2 vol.) in 1934 and 1935, L’être et les êtres in 1935., and a new version of L’action (2 vol) in 1936 and 1937. The later works reflect not only a deepened philosophical conception of the problems Blondel grapples with, nor simply a greater contact with and comparison to the thoughts of other philosophers, but also a more systematic structure of the problems. By treating the categories of thought and being rigorously in two separate, but related, works, he evades some of the difficulties that arise by placing action as the primary category. The various studies, however, form a cohesive whole, which is, in the end, rounded out by his more properly theological works, L’esprit chrétien and Les exigences philosophiques de chrétienité, and All of them culminate, like the first L’action, in considerations of the “option” and in the relationship to God. Only a greatly adumbrated account can be given here of these five volumes of work, but perhaps the key points can be made evident. In terms of this article, this requires a presentation that departs from Blondel’s explicit structuring of the works and instead places the key points in relation to each other synthetically.
In La Pensée, Blondel outlines a doctrine of “unthought thought”, or “cosmic” thought, thought that has not been thought by any human thinker, but nonetheless admits partially of being brought to intelligibility in a mediated fashion by human thinkers. This intelligible structure of phenomena does not remain, however, for the observer, merely immanent structures of phenomena, a dialectic of nature to be discovered and participated within. Nor does the thinking subject alone supply the determination to the reason and order it finds in the cosmos it explores, as in a dialectic of spirit. The thinking and acting human subject represents, not the ground of being and thought, nor simply a function or product of being or previous human thought, but rather an insufficient acting and thinking being whose action has its intelligibility and whose thought has its power of action only partly on its own basis. In effect, Blondel elaborates a dialectic of the supernatural that does not, as those of German Idealism do, reduce the spiritual to the human, a dialectic between nature, spirit, and God, which is a dialectic unfinished but not undetermined from the perspective of the human agent. In La Pensée, this takes place in terms of intelligibility , and in terms of the relationship of the subject to two constituitive types of thought.
In L’être et les êtres, the same problematic is approached in ontological terms, ultimately through the notion of created being. Blondel denounces various forms of what he calls “ontologisme”, ontologies that falsely hypostatize or reify some aspect of being as the ground or essence of all other beings and of Being itself. As he noted in La Pensée and comes to note in both L’action (1893) and the later L’action. There are striking similarities, given this formulation, between Heidegger’s insistences throughout his works that the question of Being has been reduced in each historical epoch to questions about beings; however, Blondel’s analyses both radically depart from Heidegger’s claim that all valuation is simply illegitimate projection onto Being on the part of the subject, and that the Christian God, as concept in a philosophical-theological system (for instance that of Thomas) does not address Being, but only a being to which all other beings are placed into relation.
In order to preserve and do justice to both the mysteriousness of Being, and the constant determination of beings, these cannot be strictly separated from each other by a concept of “ontological difference” as Heidegger claims. Rather than Being having to be unfigurable, it must be figured, there is an exigency within our very relation to Being that requires us to give it, and to discover within it, determination and solidarity not only between beings and other beings, the immanent order, but also between beings and Being, the order of transcendence. At the same time, from the human side, the thought of this, the being that supports this, and the action that produces this is always insufficient, meaning not that it necessarily fails, but that it requires the succor, teleological draw, and assistance of a greater Being, the “uniquely necessary”. Blondel argues that this is the Christian God.
It is for these reasons that the concept of created being is taken by Blondel to be the only truly coherent and consistent one. Any other ontology, in particular those of various forms of idealism, is more than simply a theory about the structure of and essence of beings; it is also an act of the willing subject, an act that covertly places the willing subject and its experiences as the center and ground of all other than itself, a form of self-idolatry. The central problem with such a position is not, however, simply that it is idolatrous, but that it betrays itself and its self-imposed philosophical task; such a position inevitably requires dismissing or reducing to another domain central phenomena of human historical existence. It is only through a study of being that acknowledges the insufficiency but also the capacity of the creature to know creation and the Creator that the being of the human person can be properly grasped. This has, as a consequence, the effect of arguing against the privileging of epistemology over a metaphysics of the knowing and acting subject, a common occurrence in Modernity.
Materiality is the first level of being that Blondel turns his critical attention to, primarily because materialisms of various sorts, as well as idealism as reactions against the stultifying effects of materialism, is a very common prejudice of Modernity. Blondel reiterates his argument made earlier in the article “L’illusion idéaliste” that any form of materialism that takes matter as something absolutely self-sufficient, as the ground of which all determinate things are made is actually a covert form of idealism, since it hypostatizes a concept, namely that of matter, and simply assumes the reducibility of all phenomena to arrangements of matter, actually to idealized structures. At the same time, Blondel does not aim to simply replace the concept of matter with that of thought and generate a new idealist system. Rather, his concern is to take account of the role of matter. Here, his account bears similarities to both the Thomistico-Aristotelean and the Marxist accounts of matter. For Thomas, prime matter is a mere conceptual necessity, a being of reason, but at the same time, our spiritual nature cannot be extricated absolutely from our matter, which provides the possibility not only for passion and duration, but also for action, sensation and intellection itself. Marx makes a distinction between vulgar materialism, which views matter and spirit as completely separate, and dialectical materialism, which views matter as already inhabited by spirit.
For Blondel, matter likewise does not simply provide the possibility of individuation and differentiation, but also of the solidarity of phenomena, even those of different orders, not least because being material also means at the same time insufficiency and determination.
Just as matter serves to separate them [beings] from Being in-itself , it also permits a participation without possible confusion with it. (EE.78)
Our material nature and the material nature of other beings we are in relation reflects our nature as thinking beings, a nature which, however, is not determined by an univocal or single grounding kind of thought.
If we have to speak according to sensible appearances and according to the common imagination, it is thought that seems to be contained in organized matter. Quite to the contrary, it is matter that is comprised between two very real faces of imperfect thought, of a thought that, irreducible to diaphanous unity, senses itself everywhere, in its effort to know (connaître), to will, to act, and to perfect itself, faced with an obstacle, a wall, an opacity, not, certainly, absolutely inscrutable, but which never allows itself to be entirely suppressed, to be entirely traversed. . . . So, matter is less a thing (chose) than the common condition of the resistances that all things (choses) oppose to us, and that we ourselves oppose to ourselves. (EE 80)
This thought finds itself split.
Our thought assumes two forms, neither self-sufficient in isolation nor directly connected, which we cannot therefore define either in their separate being or in their conjunction, and which operate, like all the generations of nature, in darkness and a kind of unconsciousness (Vol. 2. 41)
Blondel calls one of these forms noétique, the type of thought that unifies, that grasps universally and abstractly. The other form is the pneumatique, thought that grasps the particular, that penetrates to singularity. Both of these require the mediation of the other, and the task of the management of these introduces new possibilities of error, or rather of making the grounds of certain errors clear, errors which correctly recognize part of the being that they misunderstand. On the one hand, one can attempt to grasp all beings, thought and action primarily through the medium of abstraction, imposing strictures thereby upon what can be considered to be real, and thereby taken into consideration. On the other hand, one can go to the other extreme and privilege something particular or singular as the sole reality, around which all else is organized.
The exigencies that these two forms of thought necessary for human being and action impose are irreconcilable in any absolute sense for a human being. This introduces two other exigencies, one of the human relation to self, the other of the human relation to God. First, the insufficiency of human thought requires that all thought must be placed in relation to, but not reduced to practical comportment. Moral action and speculative knowledge thereby both depend
on the use to which the willing subject puts the two types of thought, not allowing itself to be dominated by either type while it relies upon them for determination of the relationships to self, world, and ultimately to God. Second, the recognition of such insufficiency also requires, given the fact that human action and thought does in fact possess a limited sufficiency, a recognition of what allows that to take place, namely the supernatural order, and ultimately the creative and loving action of God.
Thought, being and action are not three separate categories that could be schematically or deductively arranged apart from one another. To begin with, both thought and action are modes of being; neither one of them could be completely separated from a general study of being, but, on the other hand, neither one of them is simply reducible to a type of being, so that, having determined general characteristics of being, one would have at the same time defined and determined all characteristics of thought and action. All thought is a kind of action as well, without, again, thought being reducible to action; being requires for its part activity as well as duration and determination, and to be already implies, not just for the human, but at all levels of being, action. Thought provides coherent and reflective intelligibility to both being and action, a capacity for self-determination, limited by its insufficiencies to fully determine being or action, but also acting as a guiding function of both.
The metaphysical trilogy is rounded out by the partially unfinished theological work, L’esprit chrétien (completed by the two studies, Le sens chrétien and De l’assimilation, brought together in the work, Exigences philosophiques du christianisme), towards which all the texts of the trilogy lead. The analyses of the previous works lead to the point where the insufficiency of solely human thought, being, and action was successively demonstrated. At the same time, this insufficiency was always in relation to the Absolute, not an absolute insufficiency; human being, thought, and action possess determinacy, and a limited substantiality and consistency. Philosophy, carried out rigorously and in as much self-honesty as possible, ends up revealing its own limitations, the areas where it no longer possess a full competence. It retains, however, a role in relation to the Absolute, to the relationship to the Absolute that is religion, and, for Blondel, in particular Catholicism. Jean Lacroix provides an excellent summation of this:
On the one hand, rational thought has revealed exigences and aspirations to which a revelation must answer. . . . On the other hand, if it is truly an answer, this revelation in turn must nourish reason itself, must magnify it in some way and enable it to develop in a way that it could not have done on its own. (Maurice Blondel: An Introduction to the Man and his Philosophy, p. 65)
Blondel, because of the systematicity of his work, has been called the “French Hegel” and the “Catholic Hegel”. In his main works, Blondel develops dialectical treatments of a set of levels of the phenomena under investigation, beginning from the requirements imposed by the subject matter itself. He treats the level of the acting subject early on in each of his works, first demonstrating that the subject cannot be reduced to any type or order of objectivity, whether it be of . The similarities to the Hegelian use of the dialectic lie in Blondel’s attention to structures of mediation and the role of determinate negation. Indicating the determination of the immanent by the transcendent does not mean referring the order of immanence simply to an order of transcendence or to a single transcendent moment, but rather means uncovering structures of mediation, by which the order of immanence is mediated by the entire structure of the transcendent, including by other levels relatively transcendent to the level treated as transcendent in relation to the immanent order, the order of phenomena being investigated. For instance, the social order is transcendent to the order of individual subjects, and mediates them in relation to each other and in the relation of the subject to itself, but the social order is itself mediated by larger social structures of shared history, and by the order of religion in relation ultimately to the Christian God.
This requires that the point of view, of analysis and description, be shifted from the immanent order to the transcendent, guided by the structure of mediation. This means that the immanent order, as in Hegelian Aufhebung, is not reduced to or nullified by the transcendent now under investigation, but is rather conserved and affirmed as an integral part of the larger structure and order, simply recognized as insufficient to itself and as mediated by the transcendent order. This recognition, from within the process of investigation of the immanent order, of the need for transcendence in order for the immanent phenomena to possess their meaning and being, is analogous to Hegel’s determinate negation, in which the negation of the thesis, the antithesis, emerges from the historical working-out of the truth and meaning of the thesis. It is through a full investigation of the immanent order, treating it provisionally as if it were fully self-sufficient and adequate to itself, that the order indicates its own negativity, its requirement for transcendence.
Blondel’s attention to the structures of the individual subject in the beginnings of his works does not at all therefore reflect a commitment to an ontology which would take those individuals as primary, and ontologically prior to the other levels of structure, in particular the social and the religious, which he later turns to. In fact, as pointed out earlier, his use of the method of immanence has as its purpose and aim to indicate the interpentration of those higher-level structures transcendent to the individual in the very structures by which the individual, the acting subject, exists. This involves Blondel in a sort of return to a realism about universals and about social structures, a realism, however, whose objects remain constrained by the same unfinished . Ontologically, one can put this in the following way. Individuals and individual things do not have full being, but the structures in which they take place do not have full being either. In terms of subject and object, one can say that both subject and object have an ontological insufficiency, which does not the same time, negate their reality or their existence.
Whereas, for Hegel, the System found its unity in the subject of Absolute Knowing, later treated as the philosophical subject or as Absolute Spirit, for Blondel, the ultimate unity comes in the Christian God as creator, who remains outside of the order of description of the relations and structures of the phenomena. Blondel, therefore, rejects Hegel’s insistence that the relation to the Absolute must, in the end, get beyond representation (Vorstellung) and assume the condition of Absolute Spirit conscious of itself in relation to its Other. Blondel also rejects Hegel’s doctrine that at the end of the process of development, all difference is no longer difference of form but only of content. For the acting human subject, who acts, thinks, and is, in relation to the Absolute, History has not come to an end, and humanity is still involved in processes that also involve development and difference in form as well as content, meaning that no speculative or theoretical body of doctrine can legitimately claim full adequacy, while, at the same time, the process of development remains one inhabited by and guided by a rationality which humanity and the acting subject can participate within fully.
Blondel’s use of the “method of immanence” (a term taken originally from Eduoard Le Roi’s works) bears a strong resemblance to methods used by other philosophical movements of the time. In that Blondel explicitly rejects anything like the Husserlian epoche, because it makes an unwarranted assumption of the possibility of suspension of claims to existence as well as a disengagement from practical and moral comportment, which in tunr does not allow the meanign of moral and practical phenomena to be grasped, Blondel’s way of getting at the phenomena bears a closer relationship to the phenomenologies of Max Scheler and Maurice Merleau-Ponty.
From the moment when I pose the theoretical problem of action and when I claim to discover the scientific solution, I no longer admit, at least provisionally and to that different point of view, the value of any practical solution. The usual words of good and evil, of duty, of culpability, that I employed are, from that moment on, denuded of meaning, until, of there is a place, I could restitute to them their fullness. (L’action. p.xix)
Scheler develops a hierarchy of values, which is not simply a hierarchy of meanings relative to each other, but also an order of constitution, ultimately guided by the value of the Holy that at the same time recognizes the relative sufficiency and absolute insufficiency of the other orders (utility, pleasure, life, and culture), and the constant interpenetration of these other orders by the transcendent as Holy. Merleau-Ponty places a constant emphasis upon the dialectic of the present and the absent, or the virtual, mediated by structures of affectivity and the human body, which is it the same time, in so far as it is a human body, socialized and oriented towards transcendence. On the other hand, Blondel’s insistence upon engaging with the phenomenon as the condition for knowledge of it does bear much in common with what Phenomenology, at its best, purports to require, getting “back to the things themselves”
Blondel’s readings of other philosophical figures also bears a striking resemblance to the type of reading carried out under the rubric of Deconstruction. There are some major differences, however, both in the aim and the method of the reading. Blondel’s style of reading is to read a text through fully, eschewing polemics and taking of reified positions until the doctrines advanced in a text have been adequately understood. Then he proceeds to develop these doctrines or theses to their fullest extent, acting as if they were true in order too see what sort of consequences they would have for the thinking and acting subject. The aim is to assess the adequacy of the doctrines as the representation of a philosophical position, and this consists in two parts. First, there is the question of the adequacy of the representation. Second there is the question of the adequacy of the developed philosophical position itself. The goal of such a reading is to allow a doctrine or philosophical position to provide evidence of its own inadequacy on its own grounds, by indicating to us the extent to which it is true and able to provide an account of itself immanently, and by thereby indicating to us the extent to which it is only relatively true and insufficient, without thereby being simply false.
In his focus upon and demonstration of the inadequacy of the various philosophical positions and theses Blondel considers in his works, the mediations of human action that remains irreducible to unreflective practice, and the necessary requirement of a transcendence which the philosophical positions and doctrines attempt to efface, disparage, or force into forgetfulness, Blondel can also be brought into a continuity with certain Western Marxist figures, perhaps most closely with Theodore Adorno. Although Blondel does not use the term until his later works, he is intent upon critiquing reified consciousness and ideology.
At present, most of Blondel’s works remain untranslated into English. Two translations of L’action (1893) exist, one by James Sommerville, the other, more recent, by Olivia Blanchette. The essays, “Letter on Apologetics” and “History and Dogma” have been translated by Alexander Dru and Illtyd Trethowan,and placed together in one volume, along with extensive introductions by the Dru and Trethowan.
- L’action: essai d’une critique de la vie et d’une science de la pratique. Alcan and Presses Universitaires de France, Paris. 1893.
- Les premiers écrits. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France. 1956 (includes the Letter on Apologetics and History and Dogma as well as several other important early works)
- Dialogues avec les philosophes, Descartes, Spinoza, Malebranche, Pascal, Saint Augustin. Paris: Aubier Montaigne. 1966. (reproduction of some of Blondel’s articles on philosophical figures)
- Patrie et Humanité Lyons: Chronique Sociale de France. 1928. (A course taught by Blondel in 1927)
- La Pensee. 2 vol.Paris: Presses Universitaires de France. 1934, 35.
- L’être et les êtres: essaie d’un ontologie concrète et intégrale. Paris: Alcan. 1935
- L’action 2 vol. Paris: Alcan. 1936, 37
- La philosophie et l’esprit chretienne. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France. 1946
- Exigences philosophiques du christianisme. Paris, Presses Universitaires de France. 1950.
- Blondel et Teilhard de Chardin; correspondance. Paris: Beauchesne. 1965.
- Correspondance philosophique. Paris: Editions du Seuil. 1961.
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Last updated: July 19, 2005 | Originally published: April/12/2001