Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Henry St. John Bolingbroke (1678—1751)

bolingbroke

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy

1. Life

Henry St. John Bolingbroke was born in Battersea England in 1678. He was educated at Eton and Oxford, after which he traveled about two years on the continent. In 1700, shortly after his return, he married the daughter of Sir Henry Winchcomb, from whom he soon separated. Up to this period, he was chiefly known for his extreme dissipation but, after entering parliament in 1701, he devoted himself to politics, joined the Tory party, and soon made himself prominent as an orator. In 1704 he was made secretary of war and retained this office until 1708 when the Whigs came into power, after which he retired from politics and applied himself to study. After resignation, Bolingbroke retained great influence as the queen’s favorite counselor. On the fall of the Whig party in 1710, he was made secretary of state for foreign affairs. In 1712, he was called to the house of lords by the title of Viscount Bolingbroke and in 1713, against the wishes of nearly the entire nation, concluded the peace of Utrecht. Having previously quarreled with his old friend Harley, now the Earl of Oxford and his most powerful rival, he contrived his dismissal in July 1714. Bolingbroke immediately proceeded to form a strong Jacobite ministry in accordance with the well-known inclinations of his royal mistress, whose death a few days after threw into disorder his dangerous and unprincipled schemes. The accession of George I was a deathblow to Bolingbroke’s political prospects, on August 28 he was deposed from office, in March 1715 he fled to France and, in August 1715 he was attainted. For some time he held the office of secretary of state to the Pretender, but his restless and ambitious spirit yearned for the ‘large excitement’ of English politics. Bolingbroke’s efforts to obtain a pardon were not successful and he retired to a small estate which he had purchased near Orleans. In 1718 his first wife died and, in 1720, he married the rich widow of the Marquis de Vilette.

A prudent use of this lady’s wealth enabled him to return to England in September 1724. His property was restored to him, but he was never permitted to take his seat in parliament. He therefore removed himself to his villa at Dawley, near Uxbridge, where he occasionally enjoyed the society of Swift, Pope, and others of his old friends with whom he had corresponded in his exile. It was at Dawley where Bolingbroke diversified his moral and metaphysical studies by his attacks on the ministry in his periodical the Craftsman, in which the letters forming his Dissertation on Parties first appeared. In 1735, finding his political hopes clouded forever, he went back to France and continued to live there until 1742. During his second residence abroad, he wrote his Letters on the Study of History in which he violently attacked the Christian religion. He died on October 1, 1751, after a long illness. His talents were brilliant and versatile; his style of writing was polished and eloquent; but his fatal lack of sincerity and honest purpose, and the low and unscrupulous ambition which made him scramble for power with a selfish indifference to national security, hindered him from looking wisely and deeply into any question. His philosophical theories are not profound, nor his conclusions solid, while his criticism of passing history is worthless.

2. Philosophy

Bolingbroke’s philosophical writings were mostly unprinted until after his death, when David Mallet published a five-volume collection of Bolingbroke’s works. The philosophical portions of this collection display his dependence on Locke, who Bolingbroke acknowledged as his “master.” Using Locke’s ideas and his own, Bolingbroke attempts to explain how one attains knowledge and what its limits are, as well as asserting his own beliefs about God and religion. In doing so, he makes virulent attacks on previous philosophers such as Plato, Malebranche, and Berkley.

Following Locke, Bolingbroke distinguishes between ideas of sensation and ideas of reflection. Borrowing further from Locke, he calls these “simple ideas” and says they are the materials out of which complex ideas are made. He goes on to say that although one may not understand the process by which objects produce sensory perceptions, one can know they do so. Likewise, one may not know how the will causes action, such as the movement of an arm, but this does not hinder one from knowing it is the will which causes it. He presents these beliefs as clear and obvious and in no need of being questioned. Bolingbroke gives less power, than does Locke, to the mind concerning its ability to combine ideas within itself, putting this power in nature instead. Bolingbroke also maintains that nature (the observable world) serves as a reliable guide, and error comes when one uses one’s faculties out of accordance with nature.

Bolingbroke is known for being a Deist. He asserts there is a God, and proving this by reason is possible. However, this God is not at all like humans, and Bolingbroke speaks of anthropomorphism with contempt. Instead, he says God is so dissimilar to human beings, the distance between them is unimaginable and no comparison between the two is possible. Bolingbroke uses the cosmological argument to demonstrate there is a God, but goes on to assert that this God is omnipotent and omniscient and always does what is best. (Bolingbroke even claims this is the best of all possible worlds.) In order to defend his view of God’s transcendence, Bolingbroke says that while one can be certain God knows everything, one can never comprehend the way in which He knows things, and goes as far as to say God’s manner of knowing cannot be understood by human beings. God’s morality is equally beyond human understanding. Our moral values are based solely on our existence as social beings who cannot live lives of isolation or follow a path of pure selfishness. These morals can be discovered by reason. While they arise out of the nature of things created by God, they are in no way indicative of a divine sense of morality. God created the world, and the nature of the world determines morality. However, this nature does not reflect the character or nature of God.

Bolingbroke states Christianity was originally a “complete” and “very plain system of religion,” was actually no more than the “natural religion,” and Jesus did not teach anything more than could be discovered by reason. Bolingbroke expresses regret that Christian teachings did not remain at their initial, simple level, and wishes they had never been corrupted by such systems as Platonism, which he regards as the product of mere imagination. His understanding of religion furthermore denies the validity of prayer by insisting one could not come into contact with one’s deity, denigrates the importance of the crucifixion in Christianity, and suggests one cannot know whether or not there is a soul which survives the death of the body.

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Last updated: April 12, 2001 | Originally published: