Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Dietrich Bonhoeffer (1906—1945)

bonhoefferFor Bonhoeffer, the foundation of ethical behaviour lay in how the reality of the world and the reality of God were reconciled in the reality of Christ. Both in his thinking and in his life, ethics were centered on the demand for action by responsible men and women in the face of evil. He was sharply critical of ethical theory and of academic concerns with ethical systems precisely because of their failure to confront evil directly. Evil, he asserted, was concrete and specific, and it could be combated only by the specific actions of responsible people in the world. The uncompromising position Bonhoeffer took in his seminal work Ethics, was directly reflected in his stance against Nazism. His early opposition turned into active conspiracy in 1940 to overthrow the regime. It was during this time, until his arrest in 1943, that he worked on Ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Resistance
  2. Ethics
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Resistance

Dietrich Bonhoeffer was born in Breslau on February 4, 1906. Dietrich and his twin sister, Sabina, were two of eight children born to Karl and Paula (von Hase) Bonhoeffer. Karl Bonhoeffer, a professor of psychiatry and Neurology at Berlin University, was Germany’s leading empirical psychologist. Dietrich received his doctorate from Berlin University in 1927, and lectured in the theological faculty during the early thirties. He was ordained a Lutheran pastor in 1931, and served two Lutheran congregations, St. Paul’s and Sydenham, in London from 1933-35.

In 1934, 2000 Lutheran pastors organized the Pastors’ Emergency League in opposition to the state church controlled by the Nazis. This organization evolved into the Confessing Church, a free and independent protestant church. Bonhoeffer served as head of the Confessing Church’s seminary at Finkenwalde. The activities of the Confessing Church were virtually outlawed and its five seminaries closed by the Nazis in 1937.

Bonhoeffer’s active opposition to National Socialism in the thirties continued to escalate until his recruitment into the resistance in 1940. The core of the conspiracy to assassinate Adolph Hitler and overthrow the Third Reich was an elite group within the Abwehr (German Military Intelligence), which included, Admiral Wilhelm Canaris, Head of Military Intelligence, General Hans Oster (who recruited Bonhoeffer), and Hans von Dohnanyi, who was married to Bonhoeffer’s sister, Christine. All three were executed with Bonhoeffer on April 9, 1945. For their role in the conspiracy, the Nazis also executed Bonhoeffer’s brother, Klaus, and a second brother-in-law, Rudiger Schleicher, on April 23, 1945, seven days before Hitler himself committed suicide on April 30.

Bonhoeffer’s role in the conspiracy was one of courier and diplomat to the British government on behalf of the resistance, since Allied support was essential to stopping the war. Between trips abroad for the resistance, Bonhoeffer stayed at Ettal, a Benedictine monastery outside of Munich, where he worked on his book, Ethics, from 1940 until his arrest in 1943. Bonhoeffer, in effect, was formulating the ethical basis for when the performance of certain extreme actions, such as political assassination, were required of a morally responsible person, while at the same time attempting to overthrow the Third Reich in what everyone expected to be a very bloody coup d’etat. This combination of action and thought surely qualifies as one of the more unique moments in intellectual history.

2. Ethics

Bonhoeffer’s critique of ethics results in a picture of an Aristotelian ethic that is Christological in expression, i.e., it shares much in common with a character-oriented morality, and at the same time it rests firmly on his Christology. For Bonhoeffer, the foundation of ethical behavior is how the reality of the world and how the reality of God are reconciled in the reality of Christ (Ethics, p. 198). To share in Christ’s reality is to become a responsible person, a person who performs actions in accordance with reality and the fulfilled will of God (Ethics, p.224). There are two guides for determining the will of God in any concrete situation: 1) the need of one’s neighbor, and 2) the model of Jesus of Nazareth. There are no other guides, since Bonhoeffer denies that we can have knowledge of good and evil (Ethics, p.231). There is no moral certainty in this world. There is no justification in advance for our conduct. Ultimately all actions must be delivered up to God for judgment, and no one can escape reliance upon God’s mercy and grace. “Before God self-justification is quite simply sin” (Ethics, p.167).

Responsible action, in other words, is a highly risky venture. It makes no claims to objectivity or certainty. It is a free venture that cannot be justified in advance (Ethics, p.249). But, nevertheless, it is how we participate in the reality of Christ, i.e., it is how we act in accordance with the will of God. The demand for responsible action in history is a demand no Christian can ignore. We are, accordingly, faced with the following dilemma: when assaulted by evil, we must oppose it directly. We have no other option. The failure to act is simply to condone evil. But it is also clear that we have no justification for preferring one response to evil over another. We seemingly could do anything with equal justification. Nevertheless, for Bonhoeffer, the reality of a demand for action without any (a priori) justification is just the moral reality we must face, if we want to be responsible people.

There are four facets to Bonhoeffer’s critique of ethics that should be noted immediately. First, ethical decisions make up a much smaller part of the social world for Bonhoeffer than they do for (say) Kant or Mill. Principally he is interested only in those decisions that deal directly with the presence of vicious behavior, and often involve questions of life and death. Second, Bonhoeffer’s own life serves as a case study for the viability of his views. Bonhoeffer is unique in this regard. His work on ethics began while he was actively involved in the German resistance to National Socialism and ended with his arrest in 1943. He fully expected that others would see his work in the conspiracy as intrinsically related to the plausibility of his ethical views. When it comes to ethics, Bonhoeffer noted, “(i)t is not only what is said that matters, but also the man who says it” (Ethics, p.267).

Third, like Aristotle, Bonhoeffer stays as close to the actual phenomenon of making moral choices as possible. What we experience, when faced with a moral choice, is a highly concrete and unique situation. It may share much with other situations, but it is, nevertheless, a distinct situation involving its own particulars and peculiarities, not excluding the fact that we are making the decisions, and not Socrates or Joan of Ark.

And finally, again like Aristotle, Bonhoeffer sees judgments of character and not action as fundamental to moral evaluation. Evil actions should be avoided, of course, but what needs to be avoided at all costs is the disposition to do evil as part of our character. “What is worse than doing evil,” Bonhoeffer notes, “is being evil” (Ethics, p.67). To lie is wrong, but what is worse than the lie is the liar, for the liar contaminates everything he says, because everything he says is meant to further a cause that is false. The liar as liar has endorsed a world of falsehood and deception, and to focus only on the truth or falsity of his particular statements is to miss the danger of being caught up in his twisted world. This is why, as Bonhoeffer says, that “(i)t is worse for a liar to tell the truth than for a lover of truth to lie” (Ethics, p.67). A falling away from righteousness is far worse that a failure of righteousness. To focus exclusively on the lie and not on the liar is a failure to confront evil.

Nevertheless, the central concern of traditional ethics remains: What is right conduct? What justifies doing one thing over another? For Bonhoeffer, there is no justification of actions in advance without criteria for good and evil, and this is not available (Ethics, p.231). Neither future consequences nor past motives by themselves are sufficient to determine the moral value of actions. Consequences have the awkward consequence of continuing indefinitely into the future. If left unattended, this feature would make all moral judgments temporary or probationary, since none are immune to radical revision in the future. What makes a consequence relevant to making an action right is something other than the fact that it is a consequence. The same is true for past motives. One motive or mental attitude surely lies behind another. What makes one mental state and not an earlier state the ultimate ethical phenomenon is something other than the fact that it is a mental state. Since neither motives nor consequences have a fixed stopping point, both are doomed to failure as moral criteria. “On both sides,” Bonhoeffer notes, “there are no fixed frontiers and nothing justifies us in calling a halt at some point which we ourselves have arbitrarily determined so that we may at last form a definite judgement” (Ethics, p.190). Without a reason for the relevance of specific motives or consequences, all moral judgments become hopelessly tentative and eternally incomplete.

What is more, general principles have a tendency to reduce all behavior to ethical behavior. To act only for the greatest happiness of the greatest number, or to act only so that the maxim of an action can become a principle of legislation, become as relevant to haircuts as they do to manslaughter. All behavior becomes moral behavior, which drains all spontaneity and joy from life, since the smallest misstep now links your behavior with the worst crimes of your race, gender, or culture. Ethics cannot be reduced to a search for general principles without reducing all of the problems of life to a bleak, pedantic, and monotonous uniformity. The “abundant fullness of life,” is denied and with it “the very essence of the ethical itself” (Ethics, p.263).

Reliance on theory, in other words, is destructive to ethics, because it interferes with our ability to deal effectively with evil. Bonhoeffer asks us to consider six strategies, six postures people often strike or adopt when attempting to deal with real ethical situations involving evil and vicious people. Any of these postures or orientations could employ principles, laws, or duties from ethical theory. But, in the end, it makes little difference what principles they invoke. The ethical postures themselves are what make responsible action impossible. A resort to the dictates of reason, for example, demands that we be fair to all the details, facts, and people involved in any concrete moral situation (Ethics, p.67). The reasonable person acts like a court of law, trying to be just to both sides of any dispute. In doing so, he or she ignores all questions of character, since all people are equal before the law, and it makes no difference who does what to whom. Thus, whenever it is in the interest of an evil person to tell the truth, the person of reason must reward him for doing so. The person of reason is helpless to do otherwise, and in the end is rejected by all, the good and the evil, and achieves nothing.

Likewise, Bonhoeffer argues, the enthusiasm of the moral fanatic or dogmatist is also ineffective for a similar reason. The fanatic believes that he or she can oppose the power of evil by a purity of will and a devotion to principles that forbid certain actions. Again, the concern is exclusively on action, and judgments of character are seen as secondary and derivative. But the richness and variety of actual, concrete situations generates questions upon questions for the application of any principle. Sooner or later, Bonhoeffer notes, the fanatic becomes entangled in non-essentials and petty details, and becomes prone to simple manipulation in the hands of evil (Ethics, p.68).

The man or woman of conscience presents an even stranger case. When faced with an inescapable ethical situation that demands action, the person of conscience experiences great turmoil and uncertainty. What the person of conscience is really seeking is peace of mind, or a return to the way things were, before everything erupted into moral chaos. Resolving the tensions is as important as doing the right thing. In fact, doing the right thing should resolve the conflicts and tensions or it is not the right thing. Consequently, people of conscience become prey to quick solutions, to actions of convenience, and to deception, because feeling good about themselves and their world is what matters ultimately. They fail completely to see, as Bonhoeffer notes, that a bad conscience, that disappointment and frustration over one’s action, may be a much healthier and stronger state for their souls to experience than peace of mind and feelings of well being (Ethics, p.68).

An emphasis on freedom and private virtuousness are even less capable of dealing effectively with evil. What Bonhoeffer means by freedom is not coextensive with the theoretical freedom of the existential either/or, where it makes no difference what we do, since we are all going to get it in the end anyway; nor is it the freedom of the positivist’s personal preference or emotivism. No, freedom here means the freedom to make exceptions to general rules or principles. The free person is the person who has the where-with-all to ignore conscience, reputation, facts, and anything else in order to make the best arrangement possible under the circumstances. This is the freedom to act in any way necessary, even to do what is wrong, in order to avoid what is worse, e.g., avoiding war by being unjust to large numbers of people, and consequently failing to see that what he thinks is worse, may still be the better, failing to see that evil can never be satiated (Ethics, p. 69).

On the other hand, the escape to a domain of private virtue is, perhaps, of all temptations the most dangerous to the Christian. This is a pulling back from the petty and vulgar affairs of the world in order to avoid being contaminated by evil. This monastic urge is rejected by Bonhoeffer, because for him there is no such thing as escaping your responsibility to act. When faced with evil, there is no middle path. You either oppose the persecution of the innocent or you share in it. No one can preserve his or her private virtue by turning away from the world (Ethics, p.69).

Bonhoeffer’s last category, duty, is perhaps the most important to him, because it is the most easily co-opted by evil; and again it makes no difference what laws we introduce to determine our duty. If a devotion to duty does not discriminate in terms of character, it will end up serving evil. “The man of duty,” Bonhoeffer observes, “will end by having to fulfill his obligations even to the devil” (Ethics, p.69).

Bonhoeffer replaces philosophical ethics and its pursuit of criteria to justify action in advance with an ethics grounded in the emergence of Christ as reconciler. The cornerstone of Bonhoeffer’s ethical world is a social/moral realism. In any given context there is always a right thing to do. This reality is a direct result of his Christology. The reality of the sensible world, with all its variety, multiplicity, and concreteness, has been reconciled with the spiritual reality of God. These two radically divorced worlds have now been made compatible and consistent in the reality of Christ (Ethics, p.195). Through Jesus the reality of God has entered the world (Ethics, p.192). If an action is to have meaning, it must correspond to what is real. Since there is only the reality of Christ, Christ is the foundation of ethics. Any Christian who attempts to avoid falsehoods and meaninglessness in his or her life must act in accordance with this reality.

Furthermore, the sole guide for acting in accordance with this reality is the model of Jesus’ selfless behavior in the New Testament. There are numerous dimensions to this model. First and foremost, your action can in no way be intended to reflect back on you, your character, or your reputation. You must, for the sake of the moment, unreservedly surrender all self-directed wishes and desires (Ethics, p.232). It is the other, another person, that is the focus of attention, and not yourself. In ethical action, the left hand really must be unaware of what the right hand is doing if the right hand is to do anything ethical. If not, your so-called good action becomes contaminated and its moral nature altered.

Bonhoeffer illustrates this notion of selfless action by contrasting the behavior of Jesus in the New Testament to that of the Pharisee. The Pharisee “…is the man to whom only the knowledge of good and evil has come to be of importance in his entire life…”(Ethics, p.30). Every moment of his life is a moment where he must choose between good and evil (Ethics, p.30). Every action, every judgment, no matter how small, is permeated with the choice of good and evil. He can confront no person without evaluating that person in terms of good and evil (Ethics, p.31). For him, all judgments are moral judgments. No gesture is immune to moral condemnation.

Jesus refuses to see the world in these terms. He lightly, almost cavalierly, casts aside many of the legal distinctions the Pharisee labors to maintain. He bids his disciples to eat on the Sabbath, even though starvation is hardly in question. He heals a woman on the Sabbath, although after eighteen years of illness she could seemingly wait a few more hours. Jesus exhibits a freedom from the law in everything he does, but nothing he does suggests all things are possible. There is nothing arbitrary about his behavior. There is, however, a simplicity and clarity. Unlike the Pharisee, he is unconcerned with the goodness or badness of those he helps, unconcerned with the personal moral worth of those he meets, talks to, dines with, or heals. He is concerned solely and entirely with the well being of another. He exhibits no other concern. He is the paradigm of selfless action, and the exact opposite of the Pharisee, whose every gesture is fundamentally self-reflective.

The responsible person is, thus, a selfless person, who does God’s will by serving the spiritual and material needs of another, since “…what is nearest to God is precisely the need of one’s neighbor” (Ethics, p.136). The selfless model of Jesus is his or her only guide to responsible action. And second, the responsible person must not hesitate to act for fear of sin. Any attempt to avoid personal guilt, any attempt to preserve moral purity by withdrawing from conflicts is morally irresponsible. For Bonhoeffer, no one who lives in this world can remain disentangled and morally pure and free of guilt (Ethics, p.244). We must not refuse to act on our neighbor’s behalf, even violently, for fear of sin. To refuse to accept guilt and bear it for the sake of another has nothing to do with Christ or Christianity. “(I)f I refuse to bear guilt for charity’s sake,” Bonhoeffer argues, “then my action is in contradiction to my responsibility which has its foundation in reality” (Ethics, p.241). The risk of guilt generated by responsible action is great and cannot be mitigated in advance by self-justifying principles. There is no certainty in a world come of age. No one, in other words, can escape a complete dependency on the mercy and grace of God.

3. References and Further Reading

All quotes from: Dietrich Bonhoeffer, Ethics, (New York: Simon & Schuster Inc., Touchstone Edition, 1995).

Works by Bonhoeffer:

  • Sanctorum Communio (The Communion of Saints)
  • Act and Being
  • The Cost of Discipleship
  • Life Together
  • Ethics
  • Letters and Papers from Prison
  • Gesammelte Schriften, 4 vols.

Author Information

Douglas Huff
Email: dhuff@gac.edu
Gustavus Adolphus College
U. S. A.

Last updated: July 19, 2005 | Originally published: