Martin Buber was a prominent twentieth century philosopher, religious thinker, political activist and educator. Born in Austria, he spent most of his life in Germany and Israel, writing in German and Hebrew. He is best known for his 1923 book, Ich und Du (I and Thou), which distinguishes between “I-Thou” and “I-It” modes of existence. Often characterized as an existentialist philosopher, Buber rejected the label, contrasting his emphasis on the whole person and “dialogic” intersubjectivity with existentialist emphasis on “monologic” self-consciousness. In his later essays, he defines man as the being who faces an “other” and constructs a world from the dual acts of distancing and relating. His writing challenges Kant, Hegel, Marx, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Dilthey, Simmel and Heidegger, and he influenced Emmanuel Lévinas.
Buber was also an important cultural Zionist who promoted Jewish cultural renewal through his study of Hasidic Judaism. He recorded and translated Hasidic legends and anecdotes, translated the Bible from Hebrew into German in collaboration with Franz Rosenzweig, and wrote numerous religious and Biblical studies. He advocated a bi-national Israeli-Palestinian state and argued for the renewal of society through decentralized, communitarian socialism. The leading Jewish adult education specialist in Germany in the 1930s, he developed a philosophy of education based on addressing the whole person through education of character, and directed the creation of Jewish education centers in Germany and teacher-training centers in Israel.
Most current scholarly work on Buber is done in the areas of pedagogy, psychology and applied social ethics.
Mordecai Martin Buber was born in Vienna in February 8, 1878. When he was three, his mother deserted him, and his paternal grandparents raised him in Lemberg (now, Lviv) until the age of fourteen, after which he moved to his father’s estate in Bukovina. Buber would only see his mother once more, when he was in his early thirties. This encounter he described as a “mismeeting” that helped teach him the meaning of genuine meeting. His grandfather, Solomon, was a community leader and scholar who edited the first critical edition of the Midrashim traditional biblical commentaries. Solomon’s estate helped support Buber until it was confiscated during World War II.
Buber was educated in a multi-lingual setting and spoke German, Hebrew, Yiddish, Polish, English, French and Italian, with a reading knowledge of Spanish, Latin, Greek and Dutch. At the age of fourteen he began to be tormented with the problem of imagining and conceptualizing the infinity of time. Reading Kant’s Prolegomena to All Future Metaphysics helped relieve this anxiety. Shortly after he became taken with Nietzsche’s Thus Spoke Zarathustra, which he began to translate into Polish. However, this infatuation with Nietzsche was short lived and later in life Buber stated that Kant gave him philosophic freedom, whereas Nietzsche deprived him of it.
Buber spent his first year of university studies at Vienna. Ultimately the theatre culture of Vienna and the give-and-take of the seminar format impressed him more than any of his particular professors. The winters of 1897-98 and 1898-99 were spent at the University of Leipzig, where he took courses in philosophy and art history and participated in the psychiatric clinics of Wilhelm Wundt and Paul Flecksig (see Schmidt’s Martin Buber’s Formative Years: From German Culture to Jewish Renewal, 1897-1909 for an analysis of Buber’s life during university studies and a list of courses taken). He considered becoming a psychiatrist, but was upset at the poor treatment and conditions of the patients.
The summer of 1899 he went to the University of Zürich, where he met his wife Paula Winkler (1877-1958, pen name Georg Munk). Paula was formally converted from Catholicism to Judaism. They had two children, Rafael (1900-90) and Eva (1901-92).
From 1899-1901 Buber attended the University of Berlin, where he took several courses with Wilhelm Dilthey and Georg Simmel. He later explained that his philosophy of dialogue was a conscious reaction against their notion of inner experience (Erlebnis) (see Mendes-Flohr’s From Mysticism to Dialogue: Martin Buber’s Transformation of German Social Thought for an analysis of the influence of Dilthey and Simmel). During this time Buber gave lectures on the seventeenth century Lutheran mystic Jakob Böhme, publishing an article on him in 1901 and writing his dissertation for the University of Vienna in 1904 “On the History of the Problem of Individuation: Nicholas of Cusa and Jakob Böhme.” After this he lived in Florence from 1905-06, working on a habilitation thesis in art history that he never completed.
In 1904 Buber came across Tzevaat Ha-RIBASH (The Testament of Rabbi Israel, the Baal-Shem Tov), a collection of sayings by the founder of Hasidism. Buber began to record Yiddish Hasidic legends in German, publishing The Tales of Rabbi Nachman, on the Rabbi of Breslov, in 1906, and The Legend of the Baal-Shem in 1907. The Legend of the Baal-Shem sold very well and influenced writers Ranier Maria Rilke, Franz Kafka and Herman Hesse. Buber was a habitual re-writer and editor of all of his writings, which went through many editions even in his lifetime, and many of these legends were later rewritten and included in his later two volume Tales of the Hasidim (1947).
At the same time Buber emerged as a leader in the Zionist movement. Initially under the influence of Theodor Herzl, Buber’s Democratic Faction of the Zionist Party, but dramatically broke away from Herzl after the 1901 Fifth Zionist Congress when the organization refused to fund their cultural projects. In contrast to Herzl’s territorial Zionism, Buber’s Zionism, like that of Ahad Ha’am, was based on cultural renewal. Buber put together the first all-Jewish art exhibition in 1901, and in 1902 co-founded Jüdischer Verlag, a publishing house that produced collections of Jewish poetry and art, with poet Berthold Feiwel, graphic artist Ephraim Mosche Lilien and writer Davis Trietsche. This dedication to the arts continued through the 1910s and 20s, as Buber published essays on theatre and helped to develop both the Hellerau Experimental Theatre and the Dusseldorf Playhouse (see Biemann and Urban’s works for Buber’s notion of Jewish Renaissance and Braiterman for Buber’s relation to contemporaneous artistic movements).
Buber was the editor of the weekly Zionist paper Die Welt in 1901 and of Die Gesellschaft, a collection of forty sociopsychological monographs, from 1905-12 (On Die Gesellschaft see Mendes-Flohr’s From Mysticism to Dialogue: Martin Buber’s Transformation of German Social Thought). His influence as a Jewish leader grew with a series of lectures given between 1909-19 in Prague for the Zionist student group Bar Kochba, later published as “Speeches on Judaism,” and was established by his editorship of the influential monthly journal Der Jude from 1916-24. He also founded, and from 1926-29 co-edited, Die Kreatur with theologian Joseph Wittig and physician Viktor von Weizsäcker. Always active in constructing dialogue across borders, this was the first high level periodical to be co-edited by members of the Jewish, Protestant and Catholic faiths. Buber continued inter-religious dialogue throughout his life, corresponding for instance with Protestant theologians Paul Tillich and Reinhold Niebuhr.
Despite his prolific publishing endeavors, Buber struggled to complete I and Thou. First drafted in 1916 and then revised in 1919, it was not until he went through a self-styled three-year spiritual ascesis in which he only read Hasidic material and Descartes’ Discourse on Method that he was able to finally publish this groundbreaking work in 1923. After I and Thou, Buber is best known for his translation of the Hebrew Bible into German. This monumental work began in 1925 in collaboration with Franz Rosenzweig, but was not completed until 1961, more than 30 years after Rosenzweig’s death.
In 1923 Buber was appointed the first lecturer in “Jewish Religious Philosophy and Ethics” at the University of Frankfurt. He resigned after Hitler came into power in 1933 and was banned from teaching until 1935, but continued to conduct Jewish-Christian dialogues and organize Jewish education until he left for British Palestine in 1938. Initially Buber had planned to teach half a year in Palestine at Hebrew University, an institution he had helped to conceive and found, and half a year in Germany. But Kristallnacht, the devastation of his library in Heppenheim and charges of Reichsfluchtsteuer (Tax on Flight from the Reich), because he had not obtained a legal emigration permit, forced his relocation.
Buber engaged in “spiritual resistance” against Nazism through communal education, seeking to give a positive basis for Jewish identity by organizing the teaching of Hebrew, the Bible and the Talmud. He reopened an influential and prestigious Frankfurt center for Jewish studies, Freies jüdisches Lehrhaus (Free Jewish House of Learning) in 1933 and directed it until his emigration. In 1934 he created and directed the “Central Office for Jewish Adult Education” for the Reichsvertretung der deutschen Juden (National Representation of German Jews).
After giving well-attended talks in Berlin at the Berlin College of Jewish Education and the Berlin Philharmonie, Buber, who as one of the leading Jewish public figures in Germany became known as the “arch-Jew” by the Nazis, was banned from speaking in public or at closed sessions of Jewish organizations. Despite extreme political pressure, he continued to give lectures and published several essays, including “The Question to the Single One” in 1936, which uses an analysis of Kierkegaard to attack the foundations of totalitarianism (see Between Man and Man).
After his emigration Buber became Chair of the Department of Sociology of Hebrew University, which he held until his retirement in 1951. Continuing the educational work he had begun in Germany, Buber established Beth Midrash l’Morei Am (School for the Education of Teachers of the People) in 1949 and directed it until 1953. This prepared teachers to live and work in the hostels and settlements of the newly arriving emigrants. Education was based on the notion of dialogue, with small classes, mutual questioning and answering, and psychological help for those coming from detention camps.
From the beginning of his Zionist activities Buber advocated Jewish-Arab unity in ending British rule of Palestine and a binational state. In 1925 he helped found Brit Shalom (Covenant of Peace) and in 1939 helped form the League for Jewish-Arab Rapprochement and Cooperation, which consolidated all of the bi-national groups. In 1942, the League created a political platform that was used as the basis for the political party the Ichud (or Ihud, that is, Union). For his work for Jewish-Arab parity Dag Hammarskjöld (then Secretary-General of the United Nations) nominated him for the Nobel Peace Prize in 1959.
In addition to his educational and political activities, the 1940s and 50s saw an outburst of more than a dozen books on philosophy, politics and religion, and numerous public talks throughout America and Europe. Buber received many awards, including the Goethe Prize of the University of Hamburg (1951), the Peace Prize of the German Book Trade (1953), the first Israeli honorary member of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences (1961), and the Erasmus Prize (1963). However, Buber’s most cherished honor was an informal student celebration of his 85th birthday, in which some 400 students from Hebrew University rallied outside his house and made him an honorary member of their student union.
On June 13, 1965 Martin Buber died. The leading Jewish political figures of the time attended his funeral. Classes were cancelled and hundreds of students lined up to say goodbye as Buber was buried in the Har-Hamenuchot cemetery in Jerusalem.
Martin Buber’s major philosophic works in English are the widely read I and Thou (1923), a collection of essays from the 1920s and 30s published as Between Man and Man, a collection of essays from the 1950s published as The Knowledge of Man: Selected Essays and Good and Evil: Two Interpretations (1952). For many thinkers Buber is the philosopher of I and Thou and he himself often suggested one begin with that text. However, his later essays articulate a complex and worthy philosophical anthropology.
Buber called himself a “philosophical anthropologist” in his 1938 inaugural lectures as Professor of Social Philosophy at the Hebrew University of Jerusalem, entitled “What is Man?” (in Between Man and Man). He states that he is explicitly responding to Kant’s question “What is man?” and acknowledges in his biographic writings that he has never fully shaken off Kant’s influence. But while Buber finds certain similarities between his thought and Kant’s, particularly in ethics, he explains in “Elements of the Interhuman” (in The Knowledge of Man, 1957) that their origin and goal differ. The origin for Buber is always lived experience, which means something personal, affective, corporeal and unique, and embedded in a world, in history and in sociality. The goal is to study the wholeness of man, especially that which has been overlooked or remains hidden. As an anthropologist he wants to observe and investigate human life and experience as it is lived, beginning with one’s own particular experience; as a philosophic anthropologist he wants to make these particular experiences that elude the universality of language understood. Any comprehensive overview of Buber’s philosophy is hampered by his disdain for systemization. Buber stated that ideologization was the worst thing that could happen to his philosophy and never argued for the objectivity of his concepts. Knowing only the reality of his own experience, he appealed to others who had analogous experiences.
Buber begins these lectures by asserting that man only becomes a problem to himself and asks “What is man?” in periods of social and cosmic homelessness. Targeting Kant and Hegel, he argues that while this questioning begins in solitude, in order for man to find who he is, he must overcome solitude and the whole way of conceiving of knowledge and reality that is based on solitude. Buber accuses Hegel of denigrating the concrete human person and community in favor of universal reason and argues that man will never be at home or overcome his solitude in the universe that Hegel postulates. With its emphasis on history, Hegel locates perfection in time rather than in space. This type of future-oriented perfection, Buber argues, can be thought, but it cannot be imagined, felt or lived. Our relationship to this type of perfection can only rest on faith in a guarantor for the future.
Instead, Buber locates realization in relations between creatures. Overcoming our solitude, which tends to oscillate between conceiving of the self as absorbed in the all (collectivism) and the all as absorbed into the self (solipsistic mysticism), we realize that we always exist in the presence of other selves, and that the self is a part of reality only insofar as it is relational. In contrast to the traditional philosophic answers to “What is man?” that fixate on reason, self-consciousness or free will, Buber argues that man is the being who faces an “other”, and a human home is built from relations of mutual confirmation.
Martin Buber’s most influential philosophic work, I and Thou (1923), is based on a distinction between two word-pairs that designate two basic modes of existence: I-Thou” (Ich-Du) and “I-It” (Ich-Es). The “I-Thou” relation is the pure encounter of one whole unique entity with another in such a way that the other is known without being subsumed under a universal. Not yet subject to classification or limitation, the “Thou” is not reducible to spatial or temporal characteristics. In contrast to this the “I-It” relation is driven by categories of “same” and “different” and focuses on universal definition. An “I-It” relation experiences a detached thing, fixed in space and time, while an “I-Thou” relation participates in the dynamic, living process of an “other”.
Buber characterizes “I-Thou” relations as “dialogical” and “I-It” relations as “monological.” In his 1929 essay “Dialogue,” Buber explains that monologue is not just a turning away from the other but also a turning back on oneself (Rückbiegung). To perceive the other as an It is to take them as a classified and hence predictable and manipulable object that exists only as a part of one’s own experiences. In contrast, in an “I-Thou” relation both participants exist as polarities of relation, whose center lies in the between (Zwischen).
The “I” of man differs in both modes of existence. The “I” may be taken as the sum of its inherent attributes and acts, or it may be taken as a unitary, whole, irreducible being. The “I” of the “I-It” relation is a self-enclosed, solitary individual (der Einzige) that takes itself as the subject of experience. The “I” of the “I-Thou” relation is a whole, focused, single person (der Einzelne) that knows itself as subject. In later writings Buber clarified that inner life is not exhausted by these two modes of being. However, when man presents himself to the world he takes up one of them.
While each of us is born an individual, Buber draws on the Aristotelian notion of entelechy, or innate self-realization, to argue that the development of this individuality, or sheer difference, into a whole personality, or fulfilled difference, is an ongoing achievement that must be constantly maintained. In I and Thou, Buber explains that the self becomes either more fragmentary or more unified through its relationships to others. This emphasis on intersubjectivity is the main difference between I and Thou and Buber’s earlier Daniel: Dialogues on Realization (1913). Like I and Thou, Daniel distinguishes between two modes of existence: orienting (Rientierung), which is a scientific grasp of the world that links experiences, and realization (Verwirklichung), which is immersion in experience that leads to a state of wholeness. While these foreshadow the “I-It” and “I-Thou” modes, neither expresses a relationship to a real “other”. In I and Thou man becomes whole not in relation to himself but only through a relation to another self. The formation of the “I” of the “I-Thou” relation takes place in a dialogical relationship in which each partner is both active and passive and each is affirmed as a whole being. Only in this relationship is the other truly an “other”, and only in this encounter can the “I” develop as a whole being.
Buber identifies three spheres of dialogue, or “I Thou” relations, which correspond to three types of otherness. We exchange in language, broadly conceived, with man, transmit below language with nature, and receive above language with spirit. Socrates is offered as the paradigmatic figure of dialogue with man, Goethe, of dialogue with nature, and Jesus, of dialogue with spirit. That we enter into dialogue with man is easily seen; that we also enter into dialogue with nature and spirit is less obvious and the most controversial and misunderstood aspect of I and Thou. However, if we focus on the “I-Thou” relationship as a meeting of singularities, we can see that if we truly enter into relation with a tree or cat, for instance, we apprehend it not as a thing with certain attributes, presenting itself as a concept to be dissected, but as a singular being, one whole confronting another.
Dialogue with spirit is the most difficult to explicate because Buber uses several different images for it. At times he describes dialogue with spirit as dialogue with the “eternal Thou,” which he sometimes calls God, which is eternally “other”. Because of this, I and Thou was widely embraced by Protestant theologians, who also held the notion that no intermediary was necessary for religious knowledge. Buber also argues that the precondition for a dialogic community is that each member be in a perpetual relation to a common center, or “eternal Thou”. Here the “eternal Thou” represents the presence of relationality as an eternal value. At other times, Buber describes dialogue with spirit as the encounter with form that occurs in moments of artistic inspiration or the encounter with personality that occurs in intensive engagement with another thinker’s works. Spiritual address is that which calls us to transcend our present state of being through creative action. The eternal form can either be an image of the self one feels called to become or some object or deed that one feels called to bring into the world.
Besides worries over Buber’s description of man’s dialogue with nature and spirit, three other main complaints have been raised against I and Thou. The first, mentioned by Walter Kaufmann in the introduction to his translation of I and Thou, is that the language is overly obscure and romantic, so that there is a risk that the reader will be aesthetically swept along into thinking the text is more profound than it actually is. Buber acknowledges that the text was written in a state of inspiration. For this reason it is especially important to also read his later essays, which are more clearly written and rigorously argued. E. la B. Cherbonnier notes in “Interrogation of Martin Buber” that every objective criticism of Buber’s philosophy would belong, by definition, to the realm of “I-It”. Given the incommensurability of the two modes, this means no objective criticism of the “I-Thou” mode is possible. In his response Buber explains that he is concerned to avoid internal contradiction and welcomes criticism. However, he acknowledges that his intention was not to create an objective philosophic system but to communicate an experience.
Finally, I and Thou is often criticized for denigrating philosophic and scientific knowledge by elevating “I-Thou” encounters above “I-It” encounters. It is important to note that Buber by no means renounces the usefulness and necessity of “I-It” modes. His point is rather to investigate what it is to be a person and what modes of activity further the development of the person. Though one is only truly human to the extent one is capable of “I-Thou” relationships, the “It” world allows us to classify, function and navigate. It gives us all scientific knowledge and is indispensable for life. There is a graduated structure of “I-It” relations as they approximate an “I-Thou” relationship, but the “I-Thou” remains contrasted to even the highest stage of an “I-It” relation, which still contains some objectification. However, each “Thou” must sometimes turn into an “It”, for in responding to an “other” we bind it to representation. Even the “eternal Thou” is turned into an It for us when religion, ethics and art become fixed and mechanical. However, an “I-It” relation can be constituted in such a way as to leave open the possibility of further “I-Thou” encounters, or so as to close off that possibility.
In I and Thou Martin Buber discusses the a priori basis of the relation, presenting the “I-Thou” encounter as the more primordial one, both in the life of humans, as when an infant reaches for its mother, and in the life of a culture, as seen in relationships in primitive cultures. However, in the 1951 essay “Distance and Relation,” written in the midst of the Palestinian conflicts, he explains that while this may be true from an anthropological perspective, from an ontological one it must be said that distance (Urdistanz) is the precondition for the emergence of relation (Beziehung), whether “I-Thou” or “I-It”. Primal distance sets up the possibility of these two basic word pairs, and the between (Zwischen) emerges out of them. Humans find themselves primally distanced and differentiated; it is our choice to then thin or thicken the distance by entering into an “I-Thou” relation with an “other” or withdrawing into an “I-It” mode of existence.
Only man truly distances, Buber argues, and hence only man has a “world.” Man is the being through whose existence what “is” becomes recognized for itself. Animals respond to the other only as embedded within their own experience, but even when faced with an enemy, man is capable of seeing his enemy as a being with similar emotions and motivations. Even if these are unknown , we are able to recognize that these unknown qualities of the other are “real” while our fantasies about the other are not. Setting at a distance is hence not the consequence of a reflective, “It” attitude, but the precondition for all human encounters with the world, including reflection.
Buber argues that every stage of the spirit, however primal, wishes to form and express itself. Form assumes communication with an interlocutor who will recognize and share in the form one has made. Distance and relation mutually correspond because in order for the world to be grasped as a whole by a person, it must be distanced and independent from him and yet also include him, and his attitude, perception, and relation to it. Consequently, one cannot truly have a world unless one receives confirmation of one’s own substantial and independent identity in one’s relations with others.
Relation presupposes distance, but distance can occur without genuine relation. Buber explains that distance is the universal situation of our existence; relation is personal becoming in the situation. Relation presupposes a genuine other and only man sees the other as other. This other withstands and confirms the self and hence meets our primal instinct for relation. Just as we have the instinct to name, differentiate, and make independent a lasting and substantial world, we also have the instinct to relate to what we have made independent. Only man truly relates, and when we move away from relation we give up our specifically human status.
Confirmation is a central theme of Martin Buber’s philosophic texts as well as his articles on education and politics. Buber argues that, while animals sometimes turn to humans in a declaring or announcing mode, they do not need to be told that they are what they are and do not see whom they address as an existence independent of their own experience. But because man experiences himself as indeterminate, his actualization of one possibility over another needs confirmation. In confirmation one meets, chooses and recognizes the other as a subject with the capacity to actualize one’s own potential. In order for confirmation to be complete one must know that he is being made present to the other.
As becomes clear in his articles on education, confirmation is not the same as acceptance or unconditional affirmation of everything the other says or does. Since we are not born completely focused and differentiated and must struggle to achieve a unified personality, sometimes we have to help an “other” to actualize themselves against their own immediate inclination. In these cases confirmation denotes a grasp of the latent unity of the other and confirmation of what the other can become. Nor does confirmation imply that a dialogic or “I-Thou” relation must always be fully mutual. Helping relations, such as educating or healing, are necessarily asymmetrical.
In the course of his writing Buber uses various terms, such as “embrace” or “inclusion” (Umfassung), “imagining the real” (Realphantasie), and in reference to Kant, “synthesizing apperception,” to describe the grasp of the other that is necessary for confirmation and that occurs in an “I-Thou” relation. “Imagining the real” is a capacity; “making present” is an event, the highest expression of this capacity in a genuine meeting of two persons. This form of knowledge is not the subsumption of the particularity of the other under a universal category. When one embraces the pain of another, this is not a sense of what pain is in general, but knowledge of this specific pain of this specific person. Nor is this identification with them, since the pain always remains their own specific pain. Buber differentiates inclusion from empathy. In empathy one’s own concrete personality and situation is lost in aesthetic absorption in the other. In contrast, through inclusion, one person lives through a common event from the standpoint of another person, without giving up their own point of view.
Martin Buber’s 1952 Good and Evil: Two Interpretations answers the question “What is man?” in a slightly different way than the essays in Between Man and Man and The Knowledge of Man. Rather than focusing on relation, Good and Evil: Two Interpretations emphasizes man’s experience of possibility and struggle to become actualized. Framing his discussion around an analysis of psalms and Zoroastrian and Biblical myths, Buber interprets the language of sin, judgment and atonement in purely existential terms that are influenced by Hasidic Judaism, Kant’s analysis of caprice (Willkür) and focused will (Wille), and Kierkegaard’s discussion of anxiety. Buber argues that good and evil are not two poles of the same continuum, but rather direction (Richtung) and absence of direction, or vortex (Wirbel). Evil is a formless, chaotic swirling of potentiality; in the life of man it is experienced as endless possibility pulling in all directions. Good is that which forms and determines this possibility, limiting it into a particular direction. We manifest the good to the extent we become a singular being with a singular direction.
Buber explains that imagination is the source of both good and evil. The “evil urge” in the imagination generates endless possibilities. This is fundamental and necessary, and only becomes “evil” when it is completely separated from direction. Man’s task is not to eradicate the evil urge, but to reunite it with the good, and become a whole being. The first stage of evil is “sin,” occasional directionlessness. Endless possibility can be overwhelming, leading man to grasp at anything, distracting and busying himself, in order to not have to make a real, committed choice. The second stage of evil is “wickedness,” when caprice is embraced as a deformed substitute for genuine will and becomes characteristic. If occasional caprice is sin, and embraced caprice is wickedness, creative power in conjunction with will is wholeness. The “good urge” in the imagination limits possibility by saying no to manifold possibility and directing passion in order to decisively realize potentiality. In so doing it redeems evil by transforming it from anxious possibility into creativity. Because of the temptation of possibility, one is not whole or good once and for all. Rather, this is an achievement that must be constantly accomplished.
Buber interprets the claim that in the end the good are rewarded and the bad punished as the experience the bad have of their own fragmentation, insubstantiality and “non-existence.” Arguing that evil can never be done with the whole being, but only out of inner contradiction, Buber states that the lie or divided spirit is the specific evil that man has introduced into nature. Here “lie” denotes a self that evades itself, as manifested not just in a gap between will and action, but more fundamentally, between will and will. Similarly, “truth” is not possessed but is rather lived in the person who affirms his or her particular self by choosing direction. This process, Buber argues, is guided by the presentiment implanted in each of us of who we are meant to become.
Along with the evasion of responsibility and refusal to direct one’s possibilities described in Good and Evil: Two Interpretations (1952), Buber argues in “Elements of the Interhuman” (1957, in The Knowledge of Man) that the main obstacle to dialogue is the duality of “being” (Sein) and “seeming” (Schein). Seeming is the essential cowardice of man, the lying that frequently occurs in self-presentation when one seeks to communicate an image and make a certain impression. The fullest manifestation of this is found in the propagandist, who tries to impose his own reality upon others. Corresponding to this is the rise of “existential mistrust” described in Buber’s 1952 address at Carnegie Hall, “Hope for this Hour” (in Pointing the Way). Mistrust takes it for granted that the other dissembles, so that rather than genuine meeting, conversation becomes a game of unmasking and uncovering unconscious motives. Buber criticizes Marx, Nietzsche and Freud for meeting the other with suspicion and perceiving the truth of the other as mere ideology. Similarly, in his acceptance speech for the 1953 Peace Prize of the German Book Trade, “Genuine Dialogue and the Possibilities of Peace” (in Pointing the Way), Buber argues the precondition for peace is dialogue, which in turn rests on trust. In mistrust one presupposes that the other is likewise filled with mistrust, leading to a dangerous reserve and lack of candor.
As it is a key component of his philosophic anthropology that one becomes a unified self through relations with others, Buber was also quite critical of psychiatrist Carl Jung and the philosophers of existence. He argued that subsuming reality under psychological categories cuts man off from relations and does not treat the whole person, and especially objected to Jung’s reduction of psychic phenomenon to categories of the private unconscious. Despite his criticisms of Freud and Jung, Buber was intensely interested in psychiatry and gave a series of lectures at the Washington School of Psychiatry at the request of Leslie H. Farber (1957, in The Knowledge of Man) and engaged in a public dialogue with Carl Rogers at the University of Michigan (see Anderson and Cissna’s The Martin Buber-Carl Rogers Dialogue: A New Transcript With Commentary). In these lectures, as well as his 1951 introduction to Hans Trüb’s Heilung aus der Begegnung (in English as “Healing Through Meeting” in Pointing the Way), Buber criticizes the tendency of psychology to “resolve” guilt without addressing the damaged relations at the root of the feeling. In addition to Farber, Rogers and Trüb, Buber’s dialogical approach to healing influenced a number of psychologists and psychoanalysts, including Viktor von Weizsäcker, Ludwig Binswanger and Arie Sborowitz.
Often labeled an existentialist, Buber rejected the association. He asserted that while his philosophy of dialogue presupposes existence, he knew of no philosophy of existence that truly overcomes solitude and lets in otherness far enough. Sartre in particular makes self-consciousness his starting point. But in an “I-Thou” relation one does not have a split self, a moment of both experience and self-reflection. Indeed, self-consciousness is one of the main barriers to spontaneous meeting. Buber explains the inability to grasp otherness as perceptual inadequacy that is fostered as a defensive mechanism in an attempt to not be held responsible to what is addressing one. Only when the other is accorded reality are we held accountable to him; only when we accord ourselves a genuine existence are we held accountable to ourselves. Both are necessary for dialogue, and both require courageous confirmation of oneself and the other.
In Buber’s examples of non-dialogue, the twin modes of distance and relation lose balance and connectivity, and one pole overshadows the other, collapsing the distinction between them. For example, mysticism (absorption in the all) turns into narcissism (a retreat into myself), and collectivism (absorption in the crowd) turns into lack of engagement with individuals (a retreat into individualism). Buber identifies this same error in Emmanuel Lévinas’ philosophy. While Lévinas acknowledged Buber as one of his main influences, the two had a series of exchanges, documented in Levinas & Buber: Dialogue and Difference, in which Buber argued that Lévinas had misunderstood and misapplied his philosophy. In Buber’s notion of subject formation, the self is always related to and responding to an “other”. But when Lévinas embraces otherness, he renders the other transcendent, so that the self always struggles to reach out to and adequately respond to an infinite other. This throws the self back into the attitude of solitude that Buber sought to escape.
In his 1952 book Eclipse of God, Martin Buber explains that philosophy usually begins with a wrong set of premises: that an isolated, inquiring mind experiences a separate, exterior world, and that the absolute is found in universals. He prefers the religious, which in contrast, is founded on relation, and means the covenant of the absolute with the particular. Religion addresses whole being, while philosophy, like science, fragments being. This emphasis on relation, particularity and wholeness is found even in Buber’s earliest writings, such as his 1904 dissertation on the panentheistic German mystics Nicholas of Cusa and Jakob Böhme, “On the History of the Problem of Individuation: Nicholas of Cusa and Jakob Böhme.” Nicholas of Cusa postulates that God is a “coincidence of opposites” and that He “contracts” himself into each creature, so that each creature best approximates God by actualizing its own unique identity. Böhme similarly presents God as both transcendent and immanent, and elaborates that perfection of individuality is developed through mutual interaction.
The same elements that attracted Buber to Nicholas of Cusa and Böhme he found fulfilled in Hasidism, producing collections of Hasidic legends and anecdotes (Tales of Rabbi Nachman, The Legend of the Baal-Shem and Tales of the Hasidim) as well as several commentaries (including On Judaism, The Origin and Meaning of Hasidism and The Way of Man: According to the Teaching of Hasidism). The Hebrew tsimtsum expresses God’s “contraction” into the manifold world so that relation can emerge. In distinction from the one, unlimited source, this manifold is limited, but has the choice and responsibility to effect the unification (yihud) of creation. The restoration of unity is described as “the freeing of the sparks,” understood as the freeing of the divine element from difference through the hallowing of the everyday.
In addition to defining Hasidism by its quest for unity, Buber contrasts the Hasidic insistence on the ongoing redemption of the world with the Christian belief that redemption has already occurred through Jesus Christ. Each is charged with the task to redeem their self and the section of creation they occupy. Redemption takes place in the relation between man and creator, and is neither solely dependent on God’s grace nor on man’s will. No original sin can prohibit man from being able to turn to God. However, Buber is not an unqualified voluntarist. As in his political essays, he describes himself as a realistic meliorist. One cannot simply will redemption. Rather, each person’s will does what it can with the particular concrete situation that faces it.
The Hebrew notions of kavana, or concentrated inner intention, and teshuva, or (re)turning to God with one’s whole being, express the conviction that no person or action is so sinful that it cannot be made holy and dedicated to God. Man hallows creation by being himself and working in his own sphere. There is no need to be other, or to reach beyond the human. Rather, one’s ordinary life activities are to be done in such a way that they are sanctified and lead to the unification of the self and creation. The legends and anecdotes of the historic zaddikim (Hasidic spiritual and community leaders) that Buber recorded depict persons who exemplify the hallowing of the everyday through the dedication of the whole person.
If hallowing is successful, the everyday is the religious, and there is no split between the political, social or religious spheres. Consequently Buber rejects the notion that God is to be found through mystical ecstasy in which one loses one’s sense of self and is lifted out of everyday experience. Some commentators, such as Paul Mendes-Flohr and Maurice Friedman, view this as a turn away from his earlier preoccupation with mysticism in texts such as Ecstatic Confessions (1909) and Daniel: Dialogues on Realization (1913). In later writings, such as “The Question to the Single One” (1936, in Between Man and Man) and “What is Common to All” (1958, in The Knowledge of Man), Buber argues that special states of unity are experiences of self-unity, not identification with God, and that many forms of mysticism express a flight from the task of dealing with the realities of a concrete situation and working with others to build a common world into a private sphere of illusion. Buber is especially critical of Kierkegaard’s assertion that the religious transcends the ethical. Drawing on Hasidic thought, he argues that creation is not an obstacle on the way to God, but the way itself.
Buber did not strictly follow Judaism’s religious laws. Worried that an “internal slavery” to religious law stunts spiritual growth, he did not believe that revelation could ever be law-giving in itself, but that revelation becomes legislation through the self-contradiction of man. Principles require acting in a prescribed way, but the uniqueness of each situation and encounter requires each to be approached anew. He could not blindly accept laws but felt compelled to ask continually if a particular law was addressing him in his particular situation. While rejecting the universality of particular laws, this expresses a meta-principle of dialogical readiness.
Buber’s interpretation of Hasidism is not without its critics. Gershom Scholem in particular accused Buber of selecting elements of Hasidism to confirm his “existentialist” philosophy. Scholem argued that the emphasis on particulars and the concrete that Buber so admired does not exist in Hasidism and that Buber’s erroneous impressions derive from his attention to oral material and personalities at the expense of theoretical texts. In general Buber had little historical or scholarly interest in Hasidism. He took Hasidism to be less a historical movement than a paradigmatic mode of communal renewal and was engaged by the dynamic meaning of the anecdotes and the actions they pointed to. In a 1943 conversation with Scholem, Buber stated that if Scholem’s interpretation of Hassidism was accurate, then he would have labored for forty years over Hasidic sources in vain, for they would no longer interest him.
In addition to his work with Hasidism, Martin Buber also translated the Bible from Hebrew into German with Franz Rosenzweig, and produced several religious analyses, including Kingship of God, Moses: The Revelation and the Covenant, On the Bible: Eighteen Studies, The Prophetic Faith and Two Types of Faith. Counter to religious thinkers such as Karl Barth and Emmanuel Lévinas, Buber argues that God is not simply a wholly transcendent other, but also wholly same, closer to each person than his or her own self. However, God can be known only in his relation to man, not apart from it. Buber interprets religious texts, and the Bible in particular, as the history of God’s relation to man from the perspective of man. Thus, it is not accurate to say that God changes throughout the texts, but that the theophany, the human experience of God, changes. Consequently, Buber characterizes his approach as tradition criticism, which emphasizes experiential truth and uncovers historical themes, in contrast to source criticism, which seeks to verify the accuracy of texts.
When translating the Bible, Buber’s goal was to make the German version as close to the original oral Hebrew as possible. Rather than smoothing over difficult or unclear passages, he preferred to leave them rough. One important method was to identify keywords (Leitworte) and study the linguistic relationship between the parts of the text, uncovering the repetition of word stems and same or similar sounding words. Buber also tried to ward against Platonizing tendencies by shifting from static and impersonal terms to active and personal terms. For instance, whereas kodesh had previously been translated “holy,” he used the term “hallowing” to emphasize activity. Similarly, God is not the “Being” but the “Existing,” and what had been rendered “Lord” became “I,” “Thou” and “He.”
Buber made two important distinctions between forms of faith in his religious studies. In the 1954 essay “Prophecy, Apocalyptic, and the Historical Hour” (in Pointing the Way), he distinguishes between “apocalyptic” approaches, which dualistically separate God from world, and regard evil as unredeemable, and “prophetic” stances, which preserve the unity of God with the world and promise the fulfillment of creation, allowing evil to find direction and serve the good. In the prophetic attitude one draws oneself together so that one can contribute to history, but in the apocalyptic attitude one fatalistically resigns oneself. The tension between these two tendencies is illustrated in his 1943 historical novel Gog and Magog: A Novel (also published as For the Sake of Heaven: A Hasidic Chronicle-Novel).
In Two Types of Faith (1951), Buber distinguishes between the messianism of Jesus and the messianism of Paul and John. While he had great respect for Jesus as a man, Buber did not believe that Jesus took himself to be divine. Jesus’ form of faith corresponds to emunah, faith in God’s continual presence in the life of each person. In contrast, the faith of Paul and John, which Buber labels pistis, is that God exists in Jesus. They have a dualistic notion of faith and action, and exemplify the apocalyptic belief in irredeemable original sin and the impossibility of fulfilling God’s law. Buber accuses Paul and John of transforming myth, which is historically and biographically situated, into gnosis, and replacing faith as trust and openness to encounter with faith in an image.
Martin Buber’s cultural Zionism, with its early emphasis on aesthetic development, was inextricably linked to his form of socialism. Buber argues that it is an ever-present human need to feel at home in the world while experiencing confirmation of one’s functional autonomy from others. The development of culture and aesthetic capacities is not an end in itself but the precondition for a fully actualized community, or “Zionism of realization” (Verwirklichungszionismus). The primary goal of history is genuine community, which is characterized by an inner disposition toward a life in common. This refutes the common misconception that an “I-Thou” relation is an exclusive affective relation that cannot work within a communal setting. Buber critiques collectivization for creating groups by atomizing individuals and cutting them off from one another. Genuine community, in contrast, is a group bound by common experiences with the disposition and persistent readiness to enter into relation with any other member, each of whom is confirmed as a differentiated being. He argues that this is best achieved in village communes such as the Israeli kibbutzim.
In his 1947 study of utopian socialism, Paths in Utopia, and 1951 essay “Society and the State” (in Pointing the Way), Buber distinguished between the social and political principles. The political principle, exemplified in the socialism of Marx and Lenin, tends towards centralization of power, sacrificing society for the government in the service of an abstract, universal utopianism. In contrast, influenced by his close friend, anarchist Gustav Landauer, Buber postulates a social principle in which the government serves to promote community. Genuine change, he insists, does not occur in a top-down fashion, but only from a renewal of man’s relations. Rather than ever-increasing centralization, he argues in favor of federalism and the maximum decentralization compatible with given social conditions, which would be an ever-shifting demarcation line of freedom.
Seeking to retrieve a positive notion of utopianism, Buber characterizes genuine utopian socialism as the ongoing realization of the latent potential for community in a concrete place. Rather than seeking to impose an abstract ideal, he argues that genuine community grows organically out of the topical and temporal needs of a given situation and people. Rejecting economic determinism for voluntarism, he insists that socialism is possible to the extent that people will a revitalization of communal life. Similarly, his Zionism is not based on the notion of a final state of redemption but an immediately attainable goal to be worked for. This shifts the notion of utopian socialism from idealization to actualization and equality.
Despite his support of the communal life of the kibbutzim, Buber decried European methods of colonization and argued that the kibbutzim would only be genuine communities if they were not closed off from the world. Unlike nationalism, which sees the nation as an end in itself, he hoped Israel would be more than a nation and would usher in a new mode of being. The settlers must learn to live with Arabs in a vital peace, not merely next to them in a pseudo-peace that he feared was just a prelude to war. As time went on, Buber became increasingly critical of Israel, stating that he feared a victory for the Jews over the Arabs would mean a defeat for Zionism.
Buber’s criticism of Israeli policies led to many public debates with its political leaders, in particular David Ben-Gurion, Israel’s first Prime Minister. In a relatively early essay, “The Task” (1922), Buber argued that the politicization of all life was the greatest evil facing man. Politics inserts itself into every aspect of life, breeding mistrust. This conviction strengthened over time, and in his 1946 essay “A Tragic Conflict” (in A Land of Two Peoples) he described the notion of a politicized “surplus” conflict. When everything becomes politicized, imagined conflict disguises itself as real, tragic conflict. Buber viewed Ben-Gurion as representative of this politicizing tendency. Nevertheless, Buber remained optimistic, believing that the greater the crisis the greater the possibility for an elemental reversal and rebirth of the individual and society.
Buber’s relationship to violence was complicated. He argued that violence does not lead to freedom or rebirth but only renewed decline, and deplored revolutions whose means were not in alignment with their end. Afraid that capital punishment would only create martyrs and stymie dialogue, he protested the sentencing of both Jewish and Arab militants and called the execution of Nazi Adolf Eichmann a grave mistake. However, he insisted that he was not a pacifist and that, sometimes, just wars must be fought. This was most clearly articulated in his 1938 exchange of letters with Gandhi, who compared Nazi Germany to the plight of Indians in South Africa and suggested that the Jews use satyagraha, or non-violent “truth-force.” Buber was quite upset at the comparison of the two situations and replied that satyagraha depends upon testimony. In the face of total loss of rights, mass murder and forced oblivion, no such testimony was possible and satyagraha was ineffective (see Pointing the Way and The Letters of Martin Buber: A Life of Dialogue).
In addition to his work as an educator, Martin Buber also delivered and published several essays on philosophy of education, including “Education,” given in 1925 in Heidelberg (in Between Man and Man). Against the progressive tone of the conference, Buber argued that the opposite of compulsion and discipline is communion, not freedom. The student is neither entirely active, so that the educator can merely free his or her creative powers, nor is the student purely passive, so that the educator merely pours in content. Rather, in their encounter, the educative forces of the instructor meet the released instinct of the student. The possibility for such communion rests on mutual trust.
The student trusts in the educator, while the educator trusts that the student will take the opportunity to fully develop herself. As the teacher awakens and confirms the student’s ability to develop and communicate herself, the teacher learns to better encounter the particular and unique in each student. In contrast to the propagandist, the true educator influences but does not interfere. This is not a desire to change the other, but rather to let what is right take seed and grow in an appropriate form. Hence they have a dialogical relationship, but not one of equal reciprocity. If the instructor is to do the job it cannot be a relationship between equals.
Buber explains that one cannot prepare students for every situation, but one can guide them to a general understanding of their position and then prepare them to confront every situation with courage and maturity. This is character or whole person education. One educates for courage by nourishing trust through the trustworthiness of the educator. Hence the presence and character of the educator is more important than the content of what is actually taught. The ideal educator is genuine to his or her core, and responds with his or her “Thou”, instilling trust and enabling students to respond with their “Thou”. Buber acknowledges that teachers face a tension between acting spontaneously and acting with intention. They cannot plan for dialogue or trust, but they can strive to leave themselves open for them.
In “Education and World-View” (1935, in Pointing the Way), Buber further elaborates that in order to prepare for a life in common, teachers must educate in such a way that both individuation and community are advanced. This entails setting groups with different world-views before each other and educating, not for tolerance, but for solidarity. An education of solidarity means learning to live from the point of view of the other without giving up one’s own view. Buber argues that how one believes is more important than what one believes. Teachers must develop their students to ask themselves on what their world-view stands, and what they are doing with it.
The New School for Social Research
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Last updated: July 9, 2010 | Originally published: