The historical Buddha, also known as Gotama Buddha, Siddhārtha Gautama, and Buddha Śākyamuni, was born in Lumbini, in the Nepalese region of Terai, near the Indian border. He is one of the most important Asian thinkers and spiritual masters of all time, and he contributed to many areas of philosophy, including epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. The Buddha’s teaching formed the foundation for Buddhist philosophy, initially developed in South Asia, then later in the rest of Asia. Buddhism and Buddhist philosophy now have a global following.
In epistemology, the Buddha seeks a middle way between the extremes of dogmatism and skepticism, emphasizing personal experience, a pragmatic attitude, and the use of critical thinking toward all types of knowledge. In ethics, the Buddha proposes a threefold understanding of action: mental, verbal, and bodily. In metaphysics, the Buddha argues that there are no self-caused entities, and that everything dependently arises from or upon something else. This allows the Buddha to provide a criticism of souls and personal identity; that criticism forms the foundation for his views about the reality of rebirth and an ultimate liberated state called “Nirvana.” Nirvana is not primarily an absolute reality beyond or behind the universe but rather a special state of mind in which all the causes and conditions responsible for rebirth and suffering have been eliminated. In philosophical anthropology, the Buddha explains human identity without a permanent and substantial self. The doctrine of non-self, however, does not imply the absolute inexistence of any type of self whatsoever, but is compatible with a conventional self composed of five psycho-physical aggregates, although all of them are unsubstantial and impermanent. Selves are thus conceived as evolving processes causally constrained by their past.
There is no complete agreement among scholars and Buddhist traditions regarding the dates of the historical Buddha. The most common dates among Buddhists are those of the Theravāda school, 623-543 B.C.E. From the middle of the 19th century until recently, Western scholars had believed the dates of the Buddha to be ca. 560-480 B.C.E. However, after the publication in 1991-2 of the proceedings of the international symposium on the date of the historical Buddha held in Göttingen in 1988, the original consensus on these dates no longer exists.
Although there is no conclusive evidence for any specific date, most current scholars locate the Buddha’s life one hundred years earlier, around the fifth century B.C.E. Some of the new dates for the Buddha’s "death" or more accurately, for his parinirvāṇa are: ca. 404 B.C.E. (R. Gombrich), between 410-390 B.C.E. (K.R. Norman), ca. 400 B.C.E. (R. Hikata), ca. 397 B.C.E. (K.T.S. Sarao), between ca.400-350 B.C.E. (H. Bechert), 383 B.C.E. (H. Nakamura), 368 B.C.E. (A. Hirakawa), between 420-380 B.C.E. (A. Bareau).
The historical Buddha did not write down any of his teachings, they were passed down orally from generation to generation for at least three centuries. Some scholars have attempted to distinguish the Buddha’s original teachings from those developed by his early disciples. Unfortunately, the contradictory conclusions have led most scholars to be skeptical about the possibility of knowing what the Buddha really taught. This however, does not mean that all Buddhist texts that attribute teachings to the Buddha are equally valuable to reconstruct his thought. The early sūtras in Pāli and other Middle Indo-Aryan languages are historically and linguistically closer to the cultural context of the Buddha than Mahāyāna sūtras in Sanskrit, Tibetan, and Chinese. This does not imply that later translations of the early sūtras in Chinese (there are no Tibetan translations of the early sūtras) are less authentic or useless in reconstructing the philosophy of the Buddha. On the contrary, the comparative study of Pāli and Chinese versions of the early sūtras can help to infer what might have been the Buddha’s position on a number of issues.
Following what seems to be a growing scholarly tendency, I will reconstruct the philosophy of the historical Buddha by drawing on the Sutta Piṭaka of the Pāli canon. More specifically, our main sources are the first four Pāli Nikāyas (Dīgha, Majjhima, Saṃyutta, Aṅguttara) and some texts of the fifth Pāli Nikāya (Dhammapada, Udāna, Itivuttaka, and Sutta Nipāta). I do not identify these sources with the Buddha’s “ipsissima verba,” that is, with “the very words” of the Buddha, even less with his “actual” thought. Whether these sources are faithful to the actual thought and teachings of the historical Buddha is an unanswerable question; I can only say that to my knowledge there are not better sources to reconstruct the philosophy of the Buddha.
According to the traditional Buddhist account, shortly after the Buddha’s death five hundred disciples gathered to compile his teachings. The Buddha’s personal assistant, Ānanda, recited the first part of the Buddhist canon, the Sūtra Piṭaka, which contains discourses in dialogue form between the Buddha, his disciples, and his contemporaries on a variety of doctrinal and spiritual questions. Ānanda is reported to have recited the sutras just as he had heard them from the Buddha; that is why Buddhist sutras begin with the words “Thus have I heard.” Another disciple, Upāli, recited the second part of the Buddhist canon, the Vinaya Piṭaka, which also contains sutras, but primarily addresses the rules that govern a monastic community. After the recitation of Ānanda and Upāli, the other disciples approved what they had heard and communally recited the teachings as a sign of agreement. The third part of the Buddhist canon or Abhidharma Piṭaka, was not recited at that moment. The Theravāda tradition claims that the Buddha taught the Abhidharma while visiting the heaven where his mother was residing.
From a scholarly perspective, the former account is questionable. It might be the case that a large collection of Buddhist texts was written down for the first time in Sri Lanka during the first century B.C.E. However, the extant Pāli canon shows clear signs of historical development in terms of both content and language. The three parts of the Pāli canon are not as contemporary as the traditional Buddhist account seems to suggest: the Sūtra Piṭaka is older than the Vinaya Piṭaka, and the Abhidharma Piṭaka represents scholastic developments originated at least two centuries after the other two parts of the canon. The Vinaya Piṭaka appears to have grown gradually as a commentary and justification of the monastic code (Prātimokṣa), which presupposes a transition from a community of wandering mendicants (the Sūtra Piṭaka period ) to a more sedentary monastic community (the Vinaya Piṭaka period). Even within the Sūtra Piṭaka it is possible to detect older and later texts.
Neither the Sūtra Piṭaka nor the Vinaya Piṭaka of the Pāli canon could have been recited at once by one person and repeated by the entire Buddhist community. Nevertheless, the Sūtra Piṭaka of the Pāli canon is of particular importance in reconstructing the philosophy of Buddha for four main reasons. First, it contains the oldest texts of the only complete canon of early Indian Buddhism, which belong to the only surviving school of that period, namely, the Theravāda school, prevalent in Sri Lanka and Southeast Asia. Second, it has been preserved in a Middle Indo-Aryan language closely related to various Prakrit dialects spoken in North of India during the third century B.C.E., including the area where the Buddha spent most of his teaching years (Magadha). Third, it expresses a fairly consistent set of doctrines and practices. Fourth, it is strikingly similar to another version of the early Sūtra Piṭaka extant in Chinese (Āgamas). This similarity seems to indicate that a great part of the Sūtra Piṭaka in Pāli does not contain exclusively Theravāda texts, and belongs to a common textual tradition probably prior to the existence of Buddhist schools.
Since the Pāli Nikāyas contain much more information about the teachings of the Buddha than about his life, it seems safe to postulate that the early disciples of the Buddha were more interested in preserving his teachings than in transmitting all the details of his life. The first complete biographies of the Buddha as well as the Jātaka stories about his former lives appeared centuries later, even after, and arguably as a reaction against, the dry lists and categorizations of early Abhidharma literature. The first complete biography of the Buddha in Pāli is the Nidānakathā, which serves as an introduction to the Jātaka verses found in the fifth Pāli Nikāya. In Sanskrit, the most popular biographies of the Buddha are the Buddhacarita attributed to the Indian poet Aśvaghoṣa (second century C.E), the Mahāvastu, and the Lalitavistara, both composed in the first century C.E.
The first four Pāli Nikāyas contain only fragmented information about the Buddha’s life. Especially important are the Mahāpadāna-suttanta, the Ariyapariyesanā-suttanta, the Mahāsaccaka-suttanta, and the Mahāparinibbāna-suttanta. According to the Mahāpadāna-suttanta, the lives of all Buddhas or perfectly enlightened beings follow a similar pattern. Like all Buddhas of the past, the Buddha of this cosmic era, also known as Gautama (Gotama in Pāli), was born into a noble family. The Buddha’s parents were King Śuddhodana and Queen Māyā. He was a member of the Śakya clan and his name was Siddhartha Gautama. Even though he was born in Lumbinī while his mother was traveling to her parents’ home, he spent the first twenty-nine years of his life in the royal capital, Kapilavastu, in the Nepalese region of Terai, close to the Indian border.
Like all past Buddhas, the conception and birth of Gautama Buddha are considered miraculous events. For instance, when all Buddhas descend into their mothers’ wombs from a heaven named Tuṣita, a splendid light shines forth and the entire universe quakes; their mothers are immaculate, healthy, and without pain of any sort during their ten months of pregnancy, but they die a week after giving birth. Buddha babies are born clean, though they are ritually bathed with two streams of water that fall from the sky; they all take seven steps toward the north and solemnly announce that this is their last rebirth.
Like former Buddhas, prince Siddhartha enjoyed all types of luxuries and sensual pleasures during his youth. Unsatisfied with this type of life, he had a crisis when he realized that everything was ephemeral and that his existence was subject to old age, sickness, and death. After seeing the serene joy of a monk and out of compassion for all living beings, he renounced his promising future as prince in order to start a long quest for a higher purpose, nirvāṇa (Pali nibbāna), which entails the cessation of old age, sickness and death. Later traditions speak of the Buddha as abandoning his wife Yaśodharā immediately after she gave birth to Rāhula, the Buddha’s only son. The Pāli Nikāyas, however, do not mention this story, and refer to Rāhula only as a young monk.
According to the Ariyapariyesanā-suttanta and the Mahāsaccaka-suttanta, the Buddha tried different spiritual paths for six years. First, he practiced yogic meditation under the guidance of Ālāra Kālāma and Uddaka Rāmaputta. After experiencing the states of concentration called base of nothingness and base of neither-perception-nor-non-perception, he realized that these lofty states did not lead to nirvana. Then the Buddha began to practice breathing exercises and fasting. The deterioration of his health led the Buddha to conclude that extreme asceticism was equally ineffective in attaining nirvana. He thus resumed eating solid food; after recovering his health, he began to practice a more moderate spiritual path, the middle path, which avoids the extremes of sensual self-indulgence and self-mortification. Soon after, the Buddha experienced enlightenment, or awakening, under a bodhi-tree. First he was inclined to inaction rather than to teaching what he had discovered. However, he changed his mind after the god Brahmā Sahampati asked him to teach. Out of compassion for all living beings, he decided to start a successful teaching career that lasted forty-five years.
It would be simplistic to dismiss all supernatural aspects of the Buddha’s life as false and consider historically true only those elements that are consistent with our contemporary scientific worldview. However, this approach towards the Buddha’s life was prevalent in the nineteenth century and a great part of the twentieth century. Today it is seen as problematic because it imposes modern western ideals of rationality onto non-western texts. Here I set aside the question of historical truth and speak exclusively of significance. The significance of all the biographies of Buddha does not lie in their historical accuracy, but rather in their effectiveness to convey basic Buddhist ideas and values throughout history. Even today, narratives about the many deeds of Buddha are successfully used to introduce Buddhists of all latitudes into the main values and teachings of Buddhism.
The supernatural elements of the Buddha’s life are as historically significant as the natural ones because they help to understand the way Buddhists conceived – and in many places continue to conceive – the Buddha. Like followers of other religious leaders, Buddhist scribes tended to glorify the sanctity of their foundational figure with extraordinary events and spectacular accomplishments. In this sense, the narratives of the Buddha are perhaps better understood as hagiographies rather than as biographies. The historical truth behind hagiographies is impossible to determine: how can we tell whether or not the Buddha was conceived without sexual intercourse; whether or not he was able to talk and walk right after his birth; whether or not he could walk over water, levitate, fly, and ascend into heaven at will? How do we know whether the Buddha was really tempted by Māra the evil one; whether there was an earthquake at the moment of his birth and death? The answers to these questions are a matter of faith. If the interpreter does not believe in the supernatural, then many narratives will be dismissed as historically false. However, for some Buddhists the supernatural events that appear in the life of Buddha did take place and are historically true.
The significance of the hagiographies of the Buddha is primarily ethical and spiritual. In fact, even if the life of Buddha did not take place as the hagiographies claim, the ethical values and the spiritual path they illustrate remain significant. Unlike other religions, the truth of Buddhism does not depend on the historicity of certain events in the life of the Buddha. Rather, the truth of Buddhism depends on the efficacy of the Buddhist path exemplified by the life of the Buddha and his disciples. In other words, if the different Buddhist paths inspired by the Buddha are useful to overcome existential dissatisfaction and suffering, then Buddhism is true regardless of the existence of the historical Buddha.
The fundamental ethical and spiritual point behind the Buddha’s life is that impermanent, conditioned, and contingent things such as wealth, social position, power, sensual pleasures, and even lofty meditative states, cannot generate a state of ultimate happiness. In order to overcome the profound existential dissatisfaction that all ephemeral and contingent things eventually generate, one needs to follow a comprehensive path of ethical and mental training conducive to the state of ultimate happiness called nirvana.
While the Buddha’s view of the spiritual path is traditionally described as a middle way between the extremes of self-indulgence and self-mortification, the Buddha’s epistemology can be interpreted as a middle way between the extremes of dogmatism and skepticism.
The extreme of dogmatism is primarily represented in the Pāli Nikāyas by Brahmanism. Brahmanism was a ritualistic religion that believed in the divine revelation of the Vedas, thought that belonging to a caste was determined by birth, and focused on the performance of sacrifice. Sacrifices involved the recitation of hymns taken from the Vedas and in many cases the ritual killing of animals.
Ritual sacrifices were offered to the Gods (gods for Buddhism) in exchange for prosperity, health, protection, sons, long life, and immortality. Only the male members of the highest caste, the priestly caste of Brahmins, could afford the professional space to seriously study the three Vedas (the Atharva Veda did not exist, or if it existed, it was not part yet of the Brahmanic tradition). Since only Brahmins knew the three Vedas, only they could recite the hymns necessary to properly perform the ritual sacrifice. Both ritual sacrifice and the social ethics of the caste system were seen as an expression of the cosmic order (Dharma) and as necessary to preserve that order.
Epistemologically speaking, Brahmanism emphasized the triple knowledge of the Vedas, and dogmatic faith in their content: “in regard to the ancient Brahmanic hymns that have come down through oral transmission and in the scriptural collections, the Brahmins come to the definite conclusion: ‘Only this is true, anything else is wrong’ ” (M.II.169).
The extreme of skepticism is represented in the Pāli Nikāyas by some members of the Śramanic movement, which consisted of numerous groups of spiritual seekers and wandering philosophers. The Sanskrit word “śramana” means “those who make an effort,” and probably refers to those who practice a spiritual discipline requiring individual effort, not just rituals performed by others. In order to become a śramana it was necessary to renounce one’s life as householder and enter into an itinerant life, which entailed the observance of celibacy and a simple life devoted to spiritual cultivation. Most śramanas lived in forests or in secluded places wandering from village to village where they preached and received alms in exchange.
The Śramanic movement was extremely diverse in terms of doctrines and practices. Most śramanas believed in free will as well as the efficacy of moral conduct and spiritual practices in order to attain liberation from the cycle of reincarnations. However, there was a minority of śramanas who denied the existence of the after life, free will, and the usefulness of ethical conduct and other spiritual practices. Probably as a reaction to these two opposite standpoints, some śramanas adopted a skeptic attitude denying the possibility of knowledge about such matters. Skeptics are described by the Buddha as replying questions by evasion (D.I.58-9), and as engaging in verbal wriggling, in eel-wriggling (amarāvikkhepa): “I don’t say it is like this. And I don’t say it is like that. And I don’t say it is otherwise. And I don’t say it is not so. And I don’t say it is not not so” (M.I. 521).
In contrast to Brahmanic dogmatism, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas did not claim to be omniscient (M.I.482); in fact, he proposed a critical attitude toward all sources of knowledge. In the Majjhima Nikāya (II.170-1), the Buddha challenges Brahmins who accept Vedic scriptures out of faith (saddhā) and oral tradition (anussava); he compares those who blindly follow scripture and tradition without having direct knowledge of what they believe with “a file of blind men each in touch with the next: the first one does not see, the middle one does not see, and the last one does not see.” The Buddha also warns Brahmins against knowledge based on likeability or emotional inclination (ruci), reflection on reasons (ākāraparivitakka), and consideration of theories (diṭṭhinijjhānakkhanti). These five sources of knowledge may be either true or false; that is, they do not provide conclusive grounds to claim dogmatically that “only this is true, anything else is wrong.”
Dogmatic claims of truth were not the monopoly of Brahmins. In the Majjhima Nikāya (I.178), the Buddha uses the simile of the elephant footprint to question dogmatic statements about him, his teachings, and his disciples: he invites his followers to critically investigate all the available evidence (different types of elephant footprints and marks) until they know and see for themselves (direct perception of the elephant in the open). The Pāli Nikāyas also refer to many śramanas who hold dogmatic views and as a consequence are involved in heated doctrinal disputes. The conflict of dogmatic views is often described as “a thicket of views, a wilderness of views, a contortion of views, a vacillation of views, a fetter of views. It is beset by suffering, by vexation, by despair, and by fever, and it does not lead to disenchantment, to dispassion, to cessation, to peace, to higher knowledge, to enlightentment, to Nibbāna” (M.I.485).
Public debates were common and probably a good way to gain prestige and converts. Any reputed Brahmin or śramana had to have not only the ability to speak persuasively but also the capacity to argue well. Rational argument played an important role in justifying doctrines and avoiding defeat in debate, which implied conversion to the other’s teaching. At the time of the Buddha many of these debates seem to have degenerated into dialectical battles that diverted from spiritual practice and led to disorientation, anger, and frustration. Although the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas utilizes reasoning to justify his positions in debates and conversations with others, he discourages dogmatic attachment to doctrines including his own (see the simile of the raft, M.I.135), and the use of his teachings for the sake of criticizing others and for winning debates (M.I.132).
Unlike the skepticism of some śramanas, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas takes clear stances on ethical and spiritual issues, and rejects neither the existence of right views (M.I.46-63) nor the possibility of knowing certain things as they are (yathābhūtaṃ). In order to counteract skepticism, the Buddha advises to the Kālāma people “not go by oral tradition, by succession of disciples, by hearsay, by the content of sacred scripture, by logical consistency, by inference, by reflection on reasons, by consideration of theories, by appearance, by respect to a teacher.” Instead, the Buddha recommends knowing things for oneself as the ultimate criterion to adjudicate between conflicting claims of truth (A.I.189).
When personal experience is not available to someone, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas proposes taking into account what is praised or censored by the wise, as well as a method to calculate the benefits of following certain opinions called the incontrovertible teaching (apaṇṇakadhamma), which, in some ways, resembles Pascal’s wager. According to the incontrovertible teaching, it would be better to believe in certain doctrines because they produce more benefits than others. For instance, even if there is no life after death and if good actions do not produce good consequences, still a moral person is praised in this life by the wise, whereas the immoral person is censured by society. However, if there is life after death and good action produce happy consequences, a moral person is praised in this life, and after death he or she goes to heaven. On the contrary, the immoral person is censured in this life, and after death he or she goes to hell (M.I.403). Therefore, it is better to believe that moral actions produce good consequences even if we do not have personal experience of karma and rebirth.
Some have interpreted the Buddha’s advice to the Kālāma people as an iconoclast rejection of tradition and faith. This, however, does little justice to the Pāli Nikāyas, where the Buddha is said to be part of a long and respectable tradition of past Buddhas, and where the first Brahmins are sometimes commended by their holiness. The Buddha shows respect for many traditional beliefs and practices of his time, and rejects only those that are unjustified, useless, or conducive to suffering for oneself and others.
Faith in the Buddha, his teachings, and his disciples, is highly regarded in the Pāli Nikāyas: it is the first of the five factors of striving (M.II.95-6), and a necessary condition to practice the spiritual path (M.III.33). Buddhist faith, however, is not unconditional or an end in and of itself but rather a means towards direct knowledge that must be based on critical examination, supported by reasons, and eventually verified or rooted in vision (dassanamūlikā) (M.I.320).
Another common interpretation of the advice to the Kālāmas is that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas only personal experience provides reliable knowledge. However, this is misleading because analogical and inferential reasoning are widely used by the Buddha and his disciples to teach others as well as in debates with non-Buddhists. Similarly, analytical or philosophical meditation is a common practice for the attainment of liberation through wisdom. Personal experience, like any other means of knowledge is to be critically examined. Except in the case of Buddhas and liberated beings, personal experience is always tainted by affective and cognitive prejudices.
The Pāli Nikāyas might give the first impression of endorsing a form of naïve or direct realism: that is, the Buddha and his disciples seem to think that the world is exactly as we perceive it to be. While it is true that the Pāli Nikāyas do not question the common sense connection between objects of knowledge and the external world, there are some texts that might support a phenomenalist reading. For instance, the Buddha defines the world as the six senses (five ordinary senses plus the mind) and their respective objects (S.IV.95), or as the six senses, the six objects, and the six types of consciousness that arise in dependence on them (S.IV.39-40).
Here, the epistemology of the Buddha is a special form of realism that allows both for the direct perception of reality and the constructions of those less realized. Only Buddhas and liberated beings perceive the world directly; that is, they see the Dharma, whose regularity and stability remains independent of the existence of Buddhas (S.II.25). Unenlightened beings, on the other hand, see the world indirectly through a veil of negative emotions and erroneous views. Some texts go so far as to suggest that the world is not simply seen indirectly, but rather that it is literally constructed by our emotional dispositions. For instance, in the Majjhima Nikāya (I.111), the Buddha explicitly states that “what one feels, one perceives” (Yaṃ vedeti, taṃ sañjānāti). That is, our knowledge is formed by our feelings. The influence of feelings in our ways of knowing can also be inferred from the twelve-link chain of dependent arising, which explains the arising and cessation of suffering. The second link, saṅkhāra, or formations, conditions the arising of the third link, consciousness. The term saṅkhāra literally means “put together,” connoting the constructive role of the mental factors that fall into this category, many of them affective in nature.
Similarly, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas says that “with what one has mentally constructed as the root cause (Yaṃ papañceti tato nidānaṃ), perceptions, concepts, and [further] mental constructions (papañcasaññāsaṅkhā) beset a man with respect to past, future, and present forms…sounds…odours…flavors…tangibles…mind-objects cognizable by the eye…ear… nose…tongue…body…mind” (M.I.111-112). That is, the knowledge of unenlightened beings has papañca, or mental constructions, as its root cause. The word papañca is a technical term that literally means diversification or proliferation; it refers to the tendency of unenlightened minds to construct or fabricate concepts conducive to suffering, especially essentialist and ego-related concepts such as “I” and “mine,” concepts which lead to a variety of negative mental states such as craving, conceit, and dogmatic views about the self (Ñāṇananda 1971).
It is precisely because our experiences are affectively and cognitively conditioned that the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas advocates a critical approach toward all sources of knowledge, including personal experience. Even the lofty experiences derived from meditation are to be analyzed carefully because they might lead to false opinions about the nature of the self, the world, and the after life. The epistemological ideal is to know things directly beyond mental constructions (papañca), which presupposes the “tranquilization of all mental formations” (sabbasaṅkhārasamatha).
Contemplative experiences are of two main types: meditative absorptions or abstractions (jhāna), and higher or direct knowledge (abhiññā). There are six classes of higher or direct knowledge: the first one refers to a variety of supernatural powers including levitation and walking on water; in this sense, it is better understood as a know-how type of knowledge. The second higher knowledge is literally called “divine ear element” or clairaudience. The third higher knowledge is usually translated as telepathy, though it means simply the ability to know the underlying mental state of others, not the reading of their minds and thoughts.
The next three types of higher knowledge are especially important because they were experienced by the Buddha the night of his enlightenment, and because they are the Buddhist counterparts to the triple knowledge of the Vedas. The fourth higher knowledge is retrocognition or knowledge of past lives, which entails a direct experience of the process of rebirth. The fifth is the divine eye or clairvoyance; that is, direct experience of the process of karma, or as the texts put it, the passing away and reappearing of beings in accordance with their past actions. The sixth is knowledge of the destruction of taints, which implies experiential knowledge of the four noble truths and the process of liberation.
Some scholars have interpreted the Buddha’s emphasis on direct experience and the verifiable nature of Buddhist faith as a form of radical empiricism (Kalupahana 1992), and logical empiricism (Jayatilleke 1963). According to the empiricist interpretation, Buddhist faith is always subsequent to critically verifying the available empirical evidence. All doctrines taught by the Buddha are empirically verifiable if one takes the time and effort to attain higher or direct knowledge, interpreted as extraordinary sense experience. For instance, the triple knowledge of enlightenment implies a direct experience of the processes of karma, rebirth, and the four noble truths. Critiques of the empiricist interpretation point out that, at least at the beginning of the path, Buddhist faith is not always based on empirical evidence, and that the purpose of extraordinary knowledge is not to verify the doctrines of karma, rebirth, and the four noble truths (Hoffman 1982, 1987).
Whether or not the Buddha’s epistemology can be considered empiricist depends on what we mean by empiricism and experience. The opposition between rationalism and empiricism and the sharp distinction between senses and reason is foreign to Buddhism. Nowhere in the Pāli Nikāyas does the Buddha say that all knowledge begins in or is acquired from sense experience. In this sense, the Buddha is not an empiricist.
The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas accepts the cosmology characteristic of his cultural context: a universe with several realms of existence, where people are reborn and die again and again (saṃsāra) depending on their past actions (karma) until they attain salvation (mokṣa). However, the Buddha substantially modifies the cosmology of his time. Against the Brahmanic tendency to understand karma as ritual action, and the Jain claim that all activities including involuntary actions constitute karma, the Buddha defines karma in terms of volition, or free will, which is expressed through thoughts, words, and behavior. That is, for the Buddha, only voluntary actions produce karma.
Another important modification is that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas, saṃsāra refers primarily to a psychophysical process that takes place within the physical universe. For instance, when the Buddha speaks about the end of the world, he says that it cannot be reached by traveling through the physical universe, but only by putting an end to suffering (saṃsāra), where “one is not born, does not age, does not die, does not pass away, and is not reborn” Accordingly, salvation is not understood in world-denying terms or as an escape from the physical universe, but rather as an inner transformation that takes place within one’s own psychophysical organism: “It is, friend, in just this fathom-high carcass endowed with perception and mind that I make known the world, the origin of the world, the cessation of the world, and the way leading to the cessation of the world.” (S.I.62; A.II.47-9).
There are five kinds of destinations within saṃsāra: hell, animal kingdom, realm of ghosts, humankind, and realm of devas or radiant beings, commonly translated as gods (M.I.73). There are many hells and heavens and life there is transitory, just as in other destinations. In some traditions there is another destination, the realm of asuras or demigods, who are jealous of the gods and who are always in conflict with them.
The Pāli Nikāyas further divide the universe of saṃsāra into three main planes of existence, each one subdivided into several realms. The three planes of existence are sensorial, fine-material, and immaterial (M.I.50). Most destinations belong to the sensorial realm. Only a minority of heavens belong to the fine-material and immaterial realms. Rebirth in a particular realm depends on past actions: good actions lead to good destinations and bad actions to bad rebirths. Rebirth as a human or in heaven is considered a good destination; rebirth in the realm of ghosts, hell, and the animal realm are bad. Human rebirth is extremely difficult to attain (S.V.455-6; M.III.169), and it is highly regarded because of its unique combination of pain and pleasure, as well as its unique conductivity for attaining enlightenment. In this last sense human rebirth is said to be even better than rebirth as a god.
Rebirth also depends on the prevalent mental states of a person during life, and especially at the moment of death. That is, there is a correlation between mental states and realms of rebirth, between cosmology and psychology. For instance, a mind where hatred and anger prevails is likely to be reborn in hell; deluded and uncultivated minds are headed toward the animal kingdom; someone obsessed with sex and food will probably become bound to earth as a ghost; loving and caring persons will be reborn in heaven; someone who frequently dwells in meditative absorptions will be reborn in the fine-material and immaterial realms. Human rebirth might be the consequence of any of the aforementioned mental states.
Perhaps the most important modification the Buddha introduces into the traditional cosmology of his time was a new view of Gods (gods within Buddhism). In the Pāli Nikāyas, gods do not play any significant cosmological role. For the Buddha, the universe has not been created by an all-knowing, all-powerful god that is the lord of the universe and father of all beings (M.I.326-7). Rather, the universe evolves following certain cyclic patterns of contraction and expansion (D.III.84-5).
Similarly, the cosmic order, or Dharma, does not depend on the will of gods, and there are many good deeds far more effective than ritual sacrifices offered to the gods (D.I144ff). Gods for the Buddha are unenlightened beings subject to birth and death that require further learning and spiritual practice in order to attain liberation; they are more powerful and spiritually more developed than humans and other living beings, but Buddhas excel them in all regards: spiritual development, wisdom, and power. Even the supreme type of god, Brahmā, offers his respects to the Buddha, praises him, and asks him to preach the Dharma for those with little dust in their eyes (M.I.168-9).
Since the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does not deny the existence of gods, only their cosmological and soteriological functions, it is inaccurate to define early Buddhism as atheistic or as non-theistic. The word atheistic is usually associated with anti-religious attitudes absent in the Buddha, and the term non-theistic seems to imply that rejecting the theistic concept of God is one of the main concerns of the Buddha, when in fact it is a marginal question in the Pāli Nikāyas.
One the most common frameworks to explain the basic teachings of early Buddhism is the four noble truths (ariyasacca, Sanskrit āryasatya). The word sacca means both truth and reality. The word ariya refers primarily to the ideal type of person the Buddhist path is supposed to generate, a noble person in the ethical and spiritual sense. Translating ariyasacca by ‘noble truths’ is somehow misleading because it gives the wrong impression of being a set of beliefs, a creed that Buddhists accept as noble and true. The four noble truths are primarily four realities whose contemplation leads to sainthood or the state of the noble ones (ariya). Other possible translations of ariyasacca are “ennobling truths” or “truths of the noble ones.”
Each noble truth requires a particular practice from the disciple; in this sense the four noble truths can be understood as four types of practice. The first noble truth, or the reality of suffering, assigns to the disciple the practice of cultivating understanding. Such understanding takes place gradually through reflection, analytical meditation, and eventually direct experience. What needs to be understood is the nature of suffering, and the different types of suffering and happiness within saṃsāra.
A common misconception about the first noble truth is to think that it presupposes a pessimistic outlook on life. This interpretation would be correct only if the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas had not taught the existence of different types of happiness and the third noble truth, or cessation of suffering; that is, the good news about the reality of nirvana, defined as the highest happiness (Dhp.203; M.I.505). Since the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas teaches the reality of both suffering and the highest happiness, perhaps it is more accurate to speak of his attitude as realist: there is a problem but there is also a solution to that problem.
The second noble truth, or reality of the origin of suffering, calls for the practice of renunciation to all mental states that generate suffering for oneself and others. The mental state that appears in the second noble truth is taṇhā, literally “thirst.” It was customary in the first Western translations of Buddhist texts (Burnouf, Fausboll, Muller, Oldenberg, Warren) to translate taṇhā by desire. This translation has misled many to think that the ultimate goal of Buddhists is the cessation of all desires. However, as Damien Keown puts it, “it is an oversimplification of the Buddhist position to assume that it seeks an end to all desire.” (1992: 222).
In fact, there are many terms in the Pāli Nikāyas that can be translated as desire, not all of them related to mental states conducive to suffering. On the contrary, there are many texts in the Pāli Nikāyas that demonstrate the positive role of certain types of desire in the Buddha’s path (Webster, 2005: 90-142). Nonetheless, the term taṇhā in the Pāli Nikāyas designates always a harmful type of desire that leads to “repeated existence” (ponobhavikā), is “associated with delight and lust” (nandirāgasahagatā), and “delights here and there” (tatra tatrābhinandinī) (M.I.48; D.II.308; etc). There is only one text (Nettipakaraṇa 87) that speaks about a wholesome type of taṇhā that leads to its own relinquishment, but this text is extra-canonical except in Myanmar.
The most common translation of taṇhā nowadays is craving. Unlike the loaded, vast, and ambivalent term desire, the term craving refers more specifically to a particular type of desire, and cannot be misinterpreted as conveying any want and aspiration whatsoever. Rather, like taṇhā in the Pāli Nikāyas, craving refers to intense (rāga can be translated by both lust and passion), obsessive, and addictive desires (the idiom tatra tatra can also be interpreted as connoting the idea of repetition or tendency to repeat itself).
Since craving, or taṇhā, does not include all possible types of desires, there is no “paradox of desire” in the Pāli Nikāyas. In other words, the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas does not teach that in order to attain liberation from suffering one has to paradoxically desire to stop all desires. There is no contradiction in willing the cessation of craving. That is, for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas it is possible to want, like, or strive for something without simultaneously craving for it.
The Pāli Nikāyas distinguish between three kinds of taṇhā: craving for sensual pleasures (kāmataṇhā), craving for existence (bhavataṇhā), and craving for non-existence (vibhavataṇhā). Following Webster, I understand the last two types of craving as “predicated on two extreme (wrong) views, those of eternalism and annihilationism” (2005:130-1). In other words, craving for existence longs for continued existence of one’s self within saṃsāra, and craving for non-existence is a reversed type of desire or aversion to one’s own destruction at the moment of death.
The underlying root of all suffering, however, is not craving but spiritual ignorance (avijjā). In the Pāli Nikāyas spiritual ignorance does not connote a mere lack of information but rather a misconception, a distorted perception of things under the influence of conceptual fabrications and affective prejudices. More specifically, ignorance refers to not knowing things as they are, the Dharma, and the four noble truths. The relinquishing of spiritual ignorance, craving, and the three roots of the unwholesome (greed or lobha, aversion or dosa, delusion or moha) entails the cultivation of many positive mental states, some of the most prominent in the Pāli Nikāyas being: wisdom or understanding (paññā), letting go (anupādāna), selflessness (alobha), love (avera, adosa, avyāpāda), friendliness (mettā), compassion (karuṇā), altruistic joy (muditā), equanimity (upekkhā), calm (samatha, passaddhi), mindfulness (sati), diligence (appamāda).
The third noble truth, or reality of the cessation of suffering, asks us to directly realize the destruction of suffering, usually expressed with a variety of cognitive and affective terms: peace, higher knowledge, the tranquilization of mental formations, the abandonment of all grasping, cessation, the destruction of craving, absence of lust, nirvana (Pali nibbāna). The most popular of all the terms that express the cessation of suffering and rebirth is nirvana, which literally means blowing out or extinguishing.
Metaphorically, the extinction of nirvana designates a mental event, namely, the extinguishing of the fires of craving, aversion, and delusion (S.IV.251). That nirvana primarily denotes a mental event, a psychological process, is also confirmed by many texts that describe the person who experiences nirvana with intransitive verbs such as to nirvanize (nibbāyati) or to parinirvanize (parinibbāyati). However, there are a few texts that seem to indicate that nirvana might also be a domain of perception (āyatana), element (dhātu), or reality (dhamma) known at the moment of enlightenment, and in special meditative absorptions after enlightenment. This domain is usually defined as having the opposite qualities of saṃsāra (Ud 8.1), or with metaphoric expressions (S.IV.369ff).
What is important to point out is that the concern of the Pāli Nikāyas is not to describe nirvana, which, strictly speaking, is beyond logic and language (It 37), but rather to provide a systematic explanation of the arising and cessation of suffering. The goal of Buddhism as it appears in the Pāli Nikāyas does not consist in believing that suffering arises and ceases like the Buddha says, but in realizing that what he teaches about suffering and its cessation is the case; that is, the Buddha’s teaching, or Dharma, is intended to be experienced by the wise for themselves (M.I.265).
The fourth noble truth, or reality of the path leading to the cessation of suffering, imposes on us the practice of developing the eightfold ennobling path. This path can be understood either as eight mental factors that are cultivated by ennobled disciples at the moment of liberation, or as different parts of the entire Buddhist path whose practice ennoble the disciple gradually. The eight parts of the Buddhist path are usually divided into three kinds of training: training in wisdom (right view and right intention), ethical training (right speech, right bodily conduct, and right livelihood), and training in concentration (right effort, right mindfulness and right concentration).
A prominent concern of the Buddha in the Pāli Nikāyas is to provide a solution to the problem of suffering. When asked about his teachings, the Buddha answers that he only teaches suffering and its cessation (M.I.140). The first noble truth describes what the Buddha means by suffering: birth, aging, illness, death, union with what is displeasing, separation from what is pleasing, not getting what one wants, the five aggregates of grasping (S.V.421).
The original Pali term for suffering is dukkha, a word that ordinarily means physical and mental pain, but that in the first noble truth designates diverse kinds of frustration, and the existential angst generated by the impermanence of life and the unavoidability of old age, disease, and death. However, when the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas mentions birth and the five aggregates of grasping, he seems to be referring to the fact that our psychophysical components are conditioned by grasping, and consequently, within saṃsāra, the cycle of births and deaths. This interpretation is consistent with later Buddhist tradition, which speaks about three types of dukkha: ordinary suffering (mental and physical pain), suffering due to change (derived from the impermanence of things), and suffering due to conditions (derived from being part of saṃsāra).
When the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas speaks about personal identity and the human predicament, he uses the technical expression “five aggregates of grasping” (pañcupādānakkhandhā). That is, the Buddha describes human existence in terms of five groups of constituents. The five aggregates are: material form (rūpa), sensations (vedanā), perceptions (saññā), mental formations (saṃkhāra), consciousness (viññāṇa). While the first aggregate refers to material components, the other four designate a variety of mental functions.
The aggregate material form is explained as the four great elements and the shape or figure of our physical body. The four great elements are earth, water, fire, and air. The earth element is further defined as whatever is solid in our body, and water as whatever is liquid. The fire element refers to “that by which one is warmed, ages, and is consumed,” and the process of digestion. The air element denotes the breathing process and movements of gas throughout the body (M.I.185ff).
The aggregate sensations denote pleasant, unpleasant and neutral feelings experienced after there is contact between the six sense organs (eye, ear, nose, tongue, body, and mind) and their six objects (forms, sounds, odors, tastes, tangible objects, and mental phenomena). The aggregate perceptions express the mental function by which someone is able to identify objects. There are six types of perceptions corresponding to the six objects of the senses. The aggregate formations express emotional and intellectual dispositions, literally volitions (sañcetanâ), towards the six objects of the senses. These dispositions are the result of past cognitive and affective conditioning, that is, past karma or past voluntary actions. The aggregate consciousness connotes the ability to know and to be aware of the six objects of the senses (S.III.59ff).
The Buddha reiterates again and again throughout the Pāli Nikāyas that any of the five aggregates “whether past, future or present, internal or external, gross or subtle, inferior or superior, far or near, ought to be seen as it actually is with right wisdom thus: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self.’ ” When the disciple contemplates the five aggregates in this way, he or she becomes disenchanted (nibbindati), lust fades away (virajjati), and he or she attains liberation due to the absence of lust (virāgā vimuccati) (M.I.138-9).
The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas justifies this view of the five aggregates as non-self with three main arguments, which are used as a method of analytical meditation, and in polemics with members of other schools. The assumption underlying the Buddha’s arguments is that something might be considered a self only if it were permanent, not leading to suffering, not dependently arisen, and subject to one’s own will. Since none of the five aggregates fulfill any of these conditions, it is wrong to see them as belonging to us or as our self.
In the first and most common argument for non-self the Buddha asks someone the following questions: “What do you think, monks, is material form permanent or impermanent?” – “Impermanent, venerable sir.” – “Is what is impermanent suffering or happiness?” – “Suffering, venerable sir.” –Is what is impermanent, suffering, and subject to change, fit to be regarded as: “this is mine, this I am, this is my self?” – “No, venerable sir” (M.I.138, etc). The same reasoning is applied to the other aggregates.
The first argument is also applied to the six sensual organs, the six objects, the six types of consciousness, perceptions, sensations, and formations that arise dependent on the contact between the senses and their objects (M.III.278ff). Sometimes the first argument for non-self is applied to the six senses and their objects without questions and answers: “Monks, the visual organ is impermanent. What is impermanent is suffering. What is suffering is non-self. What is non-self ought to be seen as it really is with right wisdom thus: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self’ ” (S.IV.1ff).
The second argument for non-self is much less frequent: “Monks, material form is non-self. If it were self, it would not lead to affliction. It would be possible [to say] with regard to material form: ‘Let my material form be thus. Let my material form not be thus.’ But precisely because it is non-self, it leads to affliction. And it is not possible [to say] with regard to material form: ‘Let my material form be thus. Let my material form not be thus’ ”(S.III.66-7). The same reasoning is applied to the other four aggregates.
The third argument deduces non-self from that fact that physical and mental phenomena depend on certain causes to exist. For instance, in (M.III.280ff), the Buddha first analyzes the dependent arising of physical and mental phenomena. Then he argues: “If anyone says: ‘the visual organ is self,’ that is unacceptable. The rising and falling of the visual organ are fully known (paññāyati). Since the rising and falling of the visual organ are fully known, it would follow that: ‘my self arises and falls.’ Therefore, it is unacceptable to say: ‘the visual organ is self.’ Thus the visual organ is non-self.” The same reasoning is applied to the other senses, their objects, and the six types of consciousness, contacts (meeting of sense, object and consciousness), sensations, and cravings derived from them.
The third argument also appears combined with the first one without questions and answers. For instance, in (A.V.188), it is said that “whatever becomes, that is conditioned, volitionally formed, dependently arisen, that is impermanent. What is impermanent, that is suffering. What is suffering, that is [to be regarded thus]: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self.’ ”
If something can be inferred from these three arguments, it is that the target of the doctrine of non-self is not all concepts of self but specifically views of the self as permanent and not dependently arisen. That is, the doctrine of non-self opposes what is technically called “views of personal identity” or more commonly translated “personality views” (sakkāyadiṭṭhi). Views of personal identity relate the five aggregates to a permanent and independent self in four ways: as being identical, as being possession of the self, as being in the self, or as the self being in them (M.I.300ff). All these views of personal identity are said to be the product of spiritual ignorance, that is, of not seeing with right wisdom the true nature of the five aggregates, their origin, their cessation, and the way leading to their cessation.
Since the Pāli Nikāyas accept the common sense usages of the word “self” (attan, Skt. ātman), primarily in idiomatic expressions and as a reflexive pronoun meaning “oneself,” the doctrine of non-self does not imply a literal negation of the self. Similarly, since the Buddha explicitly criticizes views that reject karma and moral responsibility (M.I.404ff), the doctrine of non-self should not be understood as the absolute rejection of moral agency and any concept of personal identity. In fact, the Buddha explicitly defines “personal identity” (sakkāya) as the five aggregates (M.I.299).
Since the sixth sense, or mind, includes the four mental aggregates, and since the ordinary five senses and their objects fall under the aggregate of material form, it can be said that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas personal identity is defined not only in terms of the five aggregates, but also in terms of the six senses and their six objects.
If the meaning of non-self were that there is literally no self whatsoever, no personal identity and no moral agency whatsoever, then the only logical conclusion would be to state that the Buddha taught nonsense and that the Pāli Nikāyas are contradictory, sometimes accepting the existence of a self and other times rejecting it. Even though no current scholar of Buddhism would endorse such an interpretation of non-self, it is still popular in some missionary circles and apologetic literature.
A more sympathetic interpretation of non-self distinguishes between two main levels of discourse (Collins 1982). The first level of discourse does not question the concept of self and freely uses personal terms and expressions in accordance with ordinary language and social conventions. The second level of discourse is philosophically more sophisticated and rejects views of self and personal identity as permanent and not dependently arisen. Behind the second level of discourse there is a technical understanding of the self and personal identity as the five aggregates, that is, as a combination of psychophysical processes, all of them impermanent and dependently originated.
This concept of the self as permanent and not dependently arisen is problematic because it is based on a misperception of the aggregates. This misperception of the five aggregates is associated with what is technically called “the conceit I am” (asmimāna) and “the underlying tendency to the conceits ‘I’ and ‘mine’ ” (ahaṃkāra-mamaṅkāra-mānānusaya). This combination of conceit and ignorance fosters different types of cravings, especially craving for immortal existence, and subsequently, speculations about the past, present, and future nature of the self and personal identity. For instance, in (D.I.30ff), the Buddha speaks of different ascetics and Brahmins who claim that the self after death is “material, immaterial, both material and immaterial, neither material nor immaterial, finite, infinite, both, neither, of uniform perception, of varied perception, of limited perception, of unlimited perception, wholly happy, wholly miserable, both, neither.” The doctrine of non-self is primarily intended to counteract views of the self and personal identity rooted in ignorance regarding the nature of the five aggregates, the conceit “I am,” and craving for immortal existence.
A minority of scholars reject the notion that the Buddha’s doctrine of non-self implies the negation of the true self, which for them is permanent and independent of causes and conditions. Accordingly, the purpose of the doctrine of non-self is simply to deny that the five aggregates are the true self. The main reason for this interpretation is that the Buddha does not say anywhere in the Pāli Nikāyas that the self does not exist; he only states that a self and what belongs to a self are not apprehended (M.I.138). Therefore, for these interpreters the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas only claims that impermanent and conditioned things like the five aggregates are not the true self. For these scholars, the Buddha does talk about the true self when he speaks about the consciousness of liberated beings (M.I.140), and the unconditioned, unborn and deathless nirvana (Bhattacarya 1973; Pérez Remón 1981).
However, the majority of Buddhist scholars agree with the traditional Buddhist self-understanding: they think that the doctrine of non-self is incompatible with any doctrine about a permanent and independent self, not just with views that mistakenly identify an alleged true self with the five aggregates. The main reason for this interpretation relates to the doctrine of dependent arising.
The importance of dependent arising (paṭiccasamuppāda) cannot be underestimated: the Buddha realized its workings during the night of his enlightenment (M.I.167). Preaching the doctrine of dependent arising amounts to preaching the Dharma (M.II.32), and whoever sees it sees the Dharma (M.I.191). The Dharma of dependent arising remains valid whether or not there are Buddhas in the world (S.II.25), and it is through not understanding it that people are trapped into the cycle of birth and death (D.II.55).
The doctrine of dependent arising can be formulated in two ways that usually appear together: as a general principle or as a chain of causal links to explain the arising and ceasing of suffering and the process of rebirth. The general principle of dependent arising states that “when this exists, that comes to be; with the arising of this, that arises. When this does not exist, that does not come to be; with the cessation of this, that ceases” (M.II.32; S.II.28).
Unlike the logical principle of conditionality, the principle of dependent arising does not designate a connection between two ideas but rather an ontological relationship between two things or events within a particular timeframe. Dependent arising expresses not only the Buddha’s understanding of causality but also his view of things as interrelated. The point behind dependent arising is that things are dependent on specific conditions (paṭicca), and that they arise together with other things (samuppāda). In other words, the principle of dependent arising conveys both ontological conditionality and the constitutive relativity of things. This relativity, however, does not mean that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas everything is interdependent or that something is related to everything else. This is a later development of Buddhist thought, not a characteristic of early Indian Buddhism.
The most comprehensive chain of dependent arising contains twelve causal links: (1) ignorance, (2) formations, (3) consciousness, (4) mentality-materiality, (5) the six senses, (6) contact, (7) sensations, (8) craving (9) grasping, (10) becoming, (11) birth, (12) old age and death. The most common formulation is as follows: with 1 as a condition 2 [comes to be]; with 2 as a condition 3 [comes to be], and so forth. Conversely, with the cessation of 1 comes the cessation of 2; with the cessation of 2 comes the cessation of 3, and so forth.
It is important to keep in mind that this chain does not imply a linear understanding of causality where the antecedent link disappears once the subsequent link has come to be. Similarly, each of the causal links is not to be understood as the one and only cause that produces the next link but rather as the most necessary condition for its arising. For instance, ignorance, the first link, is not the only cause of the process of suffering but rather the cause most necessary for the continuation of such a process. For the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas, as well as for later Buddhist tradition, there is always a multiplicity of causes and conditions at play.
The traditional interpretation divides the twelve link chain of dependent arising into three lives. The first two links (ignorance and formations) belong to the past life: due to a misperception of the nature of the five aggregates, a person (the five aggregates) performs voluntary actions: mental, verbal, and bodily actions, with wholesome, unwholesome, and neutral karmic effects. The next ten factors correspond to the present life: the karmic effects of past voluntary formations are stored in consciousness and transferred to the next life. Consciousness together with the other mental aggregates combines with a new physical body to constitute a new psychophysical organism (mentality-materiality). This new stage of the five aggregates develops the six senses and the ability to establish contact with their six objects. Contacts with objects of the senses produce pleasant, unpleasant and neutral sensations. If the sensations are pleasant, the person usually responds with cravings for more pleasant experiences, and if the sensations are unpleasant, with aversion. Craving and aversion, as well as the underlying ignorance of the nature of the five aggregates are fundamental causes of suffering and rebirth: the three roots of the unwholesome according to the Pāli Nikāyas, or the three mental poisons according to later Buddhist traditions.
By repeating the affective responses of craving and aversion, the person becomes more and more dependent on whatever leads to more pleasant sensations and less unpleasant ones. This creates a variety of emotional dependencies and a tendency to grasp or hold onto what causes pleasure and avoids pain. The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas speaks about four types of grasping: towards sensual pleasures, views, rites-and-observances, and especially towards doctrines of a [permanent and independent] self (D.II.57-8).
The original term for grasping is upādāna, which also designates the fuel or supply necessary to maintain a fire. In this sense, grasping is the psychological fuel that maintains the fires of craving, aversion, and delusion, the fires whose extinction is called nirvana. The Buddha’s ideal of letting go and detachment should not be misunderstood as the absence of any emotions whatsoever including love and compassion, but specifically as the absence of emotions associated with craving, aversion, and delusion. Motivated by grasping and the three mental fires, the five aggregates perform further voluntary actions, whose karmic effects perpetuate existence within the cycle of rebirth and subsequent suffering. The last two links (birth, aging and death) refer to the future life. At the end of this present existence, a new birth of the five aggregates will take place followed by old age, death, and other kinds of suffering.
The twelve-link chain of dependent arising explains the processes of rebirth and suffering without presupposing a permanent and independent self. The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas makes this point explicit in his passionate rebuttal of the monk Sāti, who claimed that it is the same consciousness that wanders through the cycle of rebirth. For the Buddha, consciousness, like the other eleven causal links, is dependent on specific conditions (M.I.258ff), which entails that consciousness is impermanent, suffering, and non-self.
Instead of a permanent and independent self behind suffering and the cycle of rebirth, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas presupposes five psychophysical sets of processes, namely, the five aggregates, which imply an impermanent and dependently-arisen concept of ‘self’ and ‘personal identity.’ In other words, the Buddha rejects substance-selves but accepts process-selves (Gowans 2003). Yet, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas explicitly refuses to use personal terms such as ‘self’ in technical explanations of rebirth and suffering, and he prefers to speak in terms of causes and conditions that produce other causes and conditions (S.II.13-4; S.II.62; M.III.19). But what happens to consciousness and the other aggregates when grasping no longer exists and the three mental fires have been extinguished? What happens when suffering ceases and the cycle of rebirth stops?
When the fires of craving, aversion, and ignorance are extinguished at the moment of enlightenment, the aggregates are liberated due to the lack of grasping. This is technically called nirvana with remainder of grasping (saupādisesa-nibbāna), or as later tradition puts it, nirvana of mental defilements (kilesa-parinibbāna). The expression ‘remainder of grasping’ refers to the five aggregates of liberated beings, which continue to live after enlightenment but without negative mental states.
The aggregates of the liberated beings perform their respective functions and, like the aggregates of anybody else, they grow old, get sick, and are subject to pleasant and unpleasant sensations until death. The difference between unenlightened and enlightened beings is that enlightened beings respond to sensations without craving or aversion, and with higher knowledge of the true nature of the five aggregates.
The definition of nirvana without remainder (anupādisesa-nibbāna) that appears in (It 38) only says that for the liberated being “all that is experienced here and now, without enchantment [another term for grasping], will be cooled (sīta).” Since “all” is defined in the Pāli Nikāyas as the six senses and their six objects (S.IV.15), which is another way of describing the individual psychophysical experience or the five aggregates, the expression “all that is experienced” refers to what happens to the aggregates of liberated beings. Since (It 38) explicitly uses the expression “here and now” (idheva), it seems impossible to conclude that the definition of nirvana without remainder is intended to say anything about nirvana or the aggregates beyond death. Rather (It 38) describes nirvana and the aggregates at the moment of death: they will be no longer subject to rebirth and they will become cooled, tranquil, at peace. The question is: what does this peace or coolness entail? What happens after the nirvana of the aggregates? Does the mind of enlightened beings survive happily ever after? Does the liberated being exist beyond death or not?
These questions are left undetermined (avyākata) by the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas. The ten questions in the the Pāli Nikāyas ask whether (1) The world is eternal; (2) The world is not eternal; (3) The world is infinite; (4) The world is finite; (5) Body and soul are one thing; (6) Body and soul are two different things; (7) A liberated being (tathāgata) exists after death; (8) A liberated being (tathāgata) does not exist after death; (9) A liberated being (tathāgata) both exists and does not exist after death; (10) A liberated being (tathāgata) neither exists nor does not exist after death. In Sanskrit Buddhist texts the ten views become fourteen by adding the last two possibilities of the tetralema (both A and B, neither A nor B) to the questions about the world.
Unfortunately for those looking for quick answers, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does not provide a straightforward yes or no response to any of these questions. When the Buddha is asked whether the liberated being exists, does not exist, both, or neither, he sets aside these questions by saying that (1) he does not hold such views, (2) he has left the questions undetermined, and (3) the questions do not apply (na upeti). The first two answers are also used to respond to questions about the temporal and spatial finitude or infinitude of the world, and the identity or difference between the soul and the body. Only the third type of answer is given to the questions about liberated beings after death.
Most presentations of early Buddhism interpret these three answers of the Buddha as an eloquent silence about metaphysical questions due primarily to pragmatic reasons, namely, the questions divert from spiritual practice and are not conducive to liberation from suffering. While the pragmatic reasons for the answers of the Buddha are undeniable, it is inaccurate to understand them as silence about metaphysical questions. In fact, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does address many metaphysical issues with his teachings of non-self and dependent arising.
The answers of the Buddha to the undetermined questions are due not only to pragmatic reasons but also to metaphysical reasons: the questions are inconsistent with the doctrines of non-self and dependent arising because they assume the existence of a permanent and independent self, a self that is either finite or infinite, identical or different from the body, existing or not existing after death. Besides pragmatic and metaphysical reasons, there are cognitive and affective reasons for the answers of the Buddha: the undetermined questions are based on ignorance about the nature of the five aggregates and craving for either immortal existence or inexistence. The questions are expressions of ‘identity views,’ that is, they are part of the problem of suffering. Answering the questions directly would have not done any good: a yes answer would have fostered more craving for immortal existence and led to eternalist views, and a no answer would have fostered further confusion and led to nihilist views (S.IV.400-1).
In the case of the undetermined questions about the liberated being, there are also apophatic reasons for answering “it does not apply.” The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas illustrates the inapplicability of the questions with the simile of the fire extinct: just as it does not make sense to ask about the direction in which an extinct fire has gone, it is inappropriate to ask about the status of the liberated being beyond death: “The fire burned in dependence on its fuel of grass and sticks. When that is used up, if it does not get any more fuel, being without fuel, it is reckoned as extinguished. Similarly, the enlightened being has abandoned the five aggregates by which one might describe him…he is liberated from reckoning in terms of the five aggregates, he is profound, immeasurable, unfathomable like the ocean” (M.I.487-8).
There are three possible interpretations of the simile of the extinct fire: (1) liberated beings no longer exist beyond death (2) liberated beings exist in a mysterious unfathomable way beyond death (3) the Buddha is silent about both the liberated being and nirvana after death. The first interpretation seems the most logical conclusion given the Buddha’s ontology of suffering and the doctrine of non-self. However, the nihilist interpretation makes Buddhist practice meaningless and contradicts texts where the Buddha criticizes teachings not conducive to spiritual practice such as materialism and determinism (M.I.401ff). But more importantly, the nihilist interpretation is vehemently rejected in the Pāli Nikāyas: “As I am not, as I do not proclaim, so have I been baselessly, vainly, falsely, and wrongly misrepresented by some ascetics and brahmins thus: ‘the ascetic Gotama [Buddha] is one who leads astray; he teaches the annihilation, the destruction, the extermination of an existing being’ ”(M.I.140).
The second interpretation appears to some as following from the Buddha’s incontrovertible response to the nihilist reading of his teachings: since the Buddha rejects nihilism, he must somehow accept the eternal existence of liberated beings, or at least the eternal existence of nirvana. For eternalist interpreters, the texts in the Pāli Nikāyas that speak about the transcendence and ineffability of liberated beings and nirvana can be understood as implying their existence after or beyond death.
There are several eternalist readings of the Buddha’s thought. We have already mentioned the most common: the doctrine of non-self merely states that the five aggregates are not the true self, which is the transcendent and ineffable domain of nirvana. However, there are eternalist interpretations within Buddhism too. That is, interpretations that are nominally consistent with the doctrine of non-self but that nevertheless speak of something as eternally existing: either the mind of liberated beings or nirvana. For instance, Theravāda Buddhists usually see nirvana as non-self, but at the same time as an unconditioned (asaṃkhata) and deathless (amata) reality. The assumption, though rarely stated, is that liberated beings dwell eternally in nirvana without a sense of “I” and “mine,” which is a transcendent state beyond the comprehension of unenlightened beings. Another eternalist interpretation is that of the Dalai Lama who, following the standard interpretation of Tibetan Buddhists, claims that the Buddha did not teach the cessation of all aggregates but only of contaminated aggregates. That is, the uncontaminated aggregates of liberated beings continue to exist individually beyond death, though they are seen as impermanent, dependently arisen, non-self, and empty of inherent existence (Dalai Lama 1975:27). Similarly, Peter Harvey understands nirvana as a selfless and objectless state of consciousness different from the five aggregates that exists temporarily during life and eternally beyond death (1995: 186-7).
The problem with eternalist interpretations is that they contradict what the Pāli Nikāyas say explicitly about the way to consider liberated beings, the limits of language, the content of the Buddha’s teachings, and dependent arising as a middle way between the extremes of eternalism and annihilationism. In (S.III.110ff), Sāriputta, the Buddha’s leading disciple in doctrinal matters, explains that liberated beings should be considered neither as annihilated after death nor as existing without the five aggregates.
In (D.II.63-4) the Buddha makes clear that consciousness and mentality-materiality, that is, the five aggregates, are the limits of designation (adhivacana), language (nirutti), cognitions (viññatti), and understanding (paññā). Accordingly, in (D.II.68) the Buddha says it is inadequate to state that the liberated being exists after death, does not exist, both, or neither. This reading is confirmed by (Sn 1076): “There is not measure (pamāṇa) of one who has gone out, that by which [others] might speak (vajju) of him does not exist. When all things have been removed, then all ways of speech (vādapathā) are also removed.”
Given the Buddha’s understanding of the limits of language and understanding in the Pāli Nikāyas, it is not surprising that he responded to the accusation of teaching the annihilation of beings, by saying that “formerly and now I only teach suffering and the cessation of suffering.” Since the Buddha does not teach anything beyond the cessation of suffering at the moment of death, that is, beyond the limits of language and understanding, it is inaccurate to accuse him of teaching the annihilation of beings. Similarly, stating that liberated beings exist after death in a mysterious way beyond the four logical possibilities of existence, non-existence, both or neither, is explicitly rejected in (S.III.118-9) and (S.IV.384), where once again the Buddha concludes that he only makes known suffering and the cessation of suffering.
If the eternalist interpretation were correct, it would have been unnecessary for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas to put so much emphasis on the teaching of dependent arising. Why would dependent arising be defined in (S.II.17) as right view and as the middle way between the extremes of eternalism and annihilationism if the truth were that the consciousness of liberated beings or the unconditioned nirvana exist eternally? If knowing and seeing dependent arising precludes someone from speculating about a permanent self in the past and the future (M.I.265), why would the Buddha teach anything about the eternal existence of liberated beings and nirvana?
In order to avoid the aforementioned contradictions entailed by eternalist readings of the Pāli Nikāyas, all texts about nirvana and the consciousness of liberated beings are to be understood as referring to this life or the moment of death, never to some mysterious consciousness or domain that exists beyond death. Since none of the texts about nirvana and liberated beings found in the Pāli Nikāyas refer unambiguously to their eternal existence beyond death, I interpret the Buddha as being absolutely silent about nirvana and liberated beings beyond death (Vélez de Cea 2004a). In other words, nothing of what the Pāli Nikāyas say goes beyond the limits of language and understanding, beyond the content of the Buddha’s teachings, and beyond dependent arising as the middle way between eternalism and annihilationism.
Instead of focusing on nirvana and liberated beings beyond death, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas emphasizes dependent arising and the practice of the four foundations of mindfulness. Dependent arising is intended to avoid views about a permanent and independent self in the past and the future (M.I.265; M.III.196ff), and the four foundations of mindfulness are said to be taught precisely to destroy such views (D.III.141). That is, the Buddha’s fundamental concern is to address the problem of suffering in the present without being distracted by views about the past or the future: “Let not a person revive the past, or on the future build his hopes; for the past has been left behind and the future has not been reached. Instead with insight let him see each presently arising state (paccuppannañca yo dhammaṃ tattha tattha vipassati); let him know that and be sure of it, invincibly, unshakeably. Today the effort must be made, tomorrow death may come, who knows?” (Bhikkhu Bodhi’s translation. M.III.193).
Early Buddhist ethics includes more than lists of precepts and more than the section on ethical training of the eightfold noble path; that is, Buddhist ethics cannot be reduced to right action (abstaining from killing, stealing, lying), right speech (abstaining from false, divisive, harsh, and useless speech), and right livelihood (abstaining from professions that harm living beings). Besides bodily and verbal actions, the Pāli Nikāyas discuss a variety of mental actions including thoughts, motivations, emotions, and perspectives. In fact, it is the ethics of mental actions that constitutes the main concern of the Buddha’s teaching.
Early Buddhist ethics encompasses the entire spiritual path, that is, bodily, verbal, and mental actions. The factors of the eightfold noble path dealing with wisdom and concentration (right view, right intentions, rights effort, right concentration, right mindfulness) relate to different types of mental actions. The term “right” (sammā) in this context does not mean the opposite of “wrong,” but rather “perfect” or “complete;” that is, it denotes the best or the most effective actions to attain liberation. This, however, does not imply that the Buddha advocates the most perfect form of ethical conduct for all his disciples.
Early Buddhist ethics is gradualist in the sense that there are diverse ways of practicing the path with several degrees of commitment; not all disciples are expected to practice Buddhist ethics with the same intensity. Monks and nuns take more precepts and are supposed to devote more time to spiritual practices than householders. However, a complete monastic code (prātimoka) like those found in later Vinaya literature does not appear in the Pāli Nikāyas. The most comprehensive formulation of early Buddhist ethics, probably common to monastic disciples and lay people, is the list of ten dark or unwholesome actions and their opposite, the ten bright or wholesome actions: three bodily actions (abstaining from killing, stealing, sexual misconduct), four verbal actions (abstaining from false, divisive, harsh, and useless speech), and tree mental actions (abstaining from covetousness, ill-will, and dogmatic views).
The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas defines action in terms of intention or choice (cetanā): “It is intention, monks, what I call action. Having intended, someone acts through body, speech, and mind” (A.III.415). The Pāli Nikāyas define the roots of unwholesome (akusala) actions as greed (lobha), aversion (dosa), and delusion (moha). Conversely, the roots of wholesome actions are defined as the opposite mental states (M.I.47). Some scholars infer from these two definitions that Buddhist ethics is an ethics of intention or an agent-based form of virtue ethics. That is, according to these scholars, for the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas, only the agent’s intention or motivation determine the goodness of actions. This interpretation, however, is disproved by many texts of the Pāli Nikāyas where good and evil actions are discussed without any reference to the underlying intention or motivation of the agent. Consequently, the more comprehensive account understands intention not as the only factor that determines the goodness of actions, but rather as the condition of possibility, the necessary condition for speaking about action in the moral sense. Without intention or choice, there is no ethical action. Similarly, motivation, while a central moral factor in Buddhist ethics, is neither the only factor nor always the most important factor to determine the goodness of actions. Understanding Buddhist ethics as concerned exclusively with the three roots of the wholesome does not fully capture the breath of moral concern of the Pāli Nikāyas (Vélez de Cea 2004b).
The fundamental moral law of the universe according to early Buddhism is what is popularly called the “law of karma”: good actions produce good consequences, and bad actions lead to bad consequences. The consequences of volitional actions can be experienced in this life or in subsequent lives. Although not everything we experience is due to past actions, physical appearance, character, lifespan, prosperity, and rebirth destination are believed to be influenced by past actions. This influence however, is not to be confused with fatalism, a position rejected in the Pāli Nikāyas. There is always room for mitigating and even eradicating the negative consequences of past actions with new volitions in the present. That is, past karma does not dictate our situation: the existence of freewill and the possibility of changing our predicament is always assumed. There is conditioning of the will and other mental factors, but no hard determinism.
A common objection to early Buddhist ethics is how there can be freewill and responsibility without a permanent self that transmigrates through lives. If there is no self, who is the agent of actions? Who experiences the consequences of actions? Is the person who performs an action in this life the same person that experiences the consequences of that action in a future life? Is it a different person? The Buddha considers these questions improper of his disciples, who are trained to explain things in terms of causes and condition (S.II.61ff; S.II.13ff)). In other words, since the Buddha’s disciples explain processes with the doctrine of dependent arising, they should avoid explanations that use personal terms and presuppose the extremes of eternalism and nihilism. The moral agent is not a substance-self but rather the five aggregates, a dynamic and dependently-arisen process-self who, like a flame or the water of a river, changes all the time and yet has some degree of continuity.
The most common interpretations of early Buddhist ethics view its nature as either a form of agent-based virtue ethics or as a sophisticated kind of consequentialism. The concern for virtue cultivation is certainly prevalent in early Buddhism, and evidently the internal mental state or motivation underlying actions is extremely important to determine the overall goodness of actions, which is the most important factor for advanced practitioners. Similarly, the concern for the consequences of actions, whether or not they lead to the happiness or the suffering of oneself and others, also pervades the Pāli Nikāyas. However, the goodness of actions in the Pāli Nikāyas does not depend exclusively on either the goodness of motivations or the goodness of consequences. Respect to status and duty, observance of rules and precepts, as well as the intrinsic goodness of certain external bodily and verbal actions are equally necessary to assess the goodness of at least certain actions. Since the foundations of right action in the Pāli Nikāyas are irreducible to one overarching principle, value or criterion of goodness, early Buddhist ethics is pluralistic in a metaethical sense. Given the unique combination of deontological, consequentialist, and virtue ethical trends found in the Pāli Nikāyas, early Buddhist ethics should be understood in its own terms as a sui generis normative theory inassimilable to Western ethical traditions.
All references to the Pāli Nikāyas are to the edition of The Pāli Text Society, Oxford. References to the Aṅguttara, Dīgha, Majjhima, and Saṃyutta Nikāyas are to the volume and page number. References to Udāna and Itivuttaka are to the page number and to Dhammapada and Sutta Nipāta to the verse number.
A. Aṅguttara Nikāya
D. Dīgha Nikāya
M. Majjhima Nikāya
S. Saṃyutta Nikāya
Sn. Sutta Nipāta
Eastern Kentucky University
U. S. A.
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