A Scottish philosopher of the latter half of the nineteenth century, Edward Caird was one of the key figures of the idealist movement that dominated British philosophy from 1870 until the mid 1920s. Best known for his studies of Kant and Hegel, he argued that “Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism.” Caird exercised a strong influence on the second generation of idealists, such as John Watson and Bernard Bosanquet. During his long and productive life, Caird was active in university and local politics and in educational and social reform. In his two series of Gifford lectures, he developed an important evolutionary account of religious conceptions ( the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity).
Edward Caird was born in Greenock, Scotland, on March 23, 1835. A younger brother of the theologian John Caird (1820-1898), Edward began his studies at the University of Glasgow (which he briefly abandoned due to ill health), later moving to Balliol College, Oxford, from which he graduated in 1863. Following his graduation, he became Tutor at Merton College, Oxford (1864-1866), but soon left for the Professorship of Moral Philosophy at Glasgow (1866-1893). There, in addition to carrying out his academic duties, Caird was active in university and local politics, and was responsible for establishing the study of political sciences at the University. Following the death of Benjamin Jowett (1817-1893), Caird returned to Oxford, where he served as Master of Balliol College until 1907. He was a founding fellow of the British Academy (1902), a corresponding member of the French Academy, and held honorary doctorates from the Universities of St Andrews (1883), Oxford (1891), Cambridge (1898) and Wales (1902).
Like many of the British idealists, Caird had a strong interest in classical literature. In his two volumes of Essays on Literature and Philosophy (1892), he brought together critical essays on Goethe, Rousseau, Carlyle, Dante and Wordsworth, with a discussion (in Volume II) of Cartesianism (Descartes, Malbranche and Spinoza) and metaphysics.
Caird’s politics were generally liberal and progressive. He supported the education of women, opposed the Anglo-Boer War (1899-1902) and, like Green, was involved in the ‘university settlement’ programs–particularly in Glasgow and in London–where recent university graduates and professionals attempted to narrow the gap between social classes by living and working among and with the poor.
In 1907, Caird resigned his position as Master of Balliol, and died the following year on November 1. He is buried in St Sepulchre’s Cemetery, Oxford, alongside Jowett and Green.
Along with T.H. Green (1836-1882), Caird was one of the first generation of British idealists, whose philosophical work was largely in reaction to the then-dominant empiricist and associationist views of Alexander Bain (1818-1903) and J.S. Mill. He had, however, an ability of literary expression which Green did not possess; he was also more inclined to discuss questions by the method of tracing the historical development of the ideas involved. But while Green died at the early age of 47, Caird enjoyed a relatively long and productive life. It is, in part, for this reason that he exercised such a strong influence—particularly on the relation of philosophy and religion—on later idealists such as John Watson (1847-1939) and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923). Though often considered to be Hegelian, Caird was arguably more profoundly influenced by Kant, although he was far from an uncritical reader.
Caird’s first major work was A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Kant (1877), focusing on the Critique of Pure Reason and the Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics. It was superseded in 1889 by The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant (two volumes) in which Caird wished to show the relation of the three Critiques and the continuity in the movement of Kant’s thought. In general, Caird was convinced that, though Kant had inaugurated a new era in philosophy with his attempt to integrate the a priori and the a posteriori, he failed to carry out this task fully. It was here that Caird’s idealism took over. In these volumes on Kant, Caird sought “to display in the very argument of the great metaphysician, who was supposed to have cut the world in two with a hatchet, an almost involuntary but continuous and inevitable regression towards objective organic unity.” Thus, he argued that “Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism.” (1877, p. 667)
A sympathetic exposition of Hegel’s philosophy is contained in his monograph on Hegel (1883) and, in 1885, his Social Philosophy and Religion of Comte (based on a collection of articles that had been previously published in the magazine, Contemporary Review) appeared. In these two works, Caird critically interprets these authors on lines of his own. Concerning Comte, for example, Caird writes that there cannot be a ‘religion of Humanity’ that is not, at the same time, a religion of God. In his treatment of Hegel, as of Kant, Caird’s purpose was to show that there is a center of unity to which the mind must come back out of all differences, however varied and alien in appearance. The analysis was preliminary to reconstruction.
Caird’s way of philosophizing differed from that of many of his contemporaries. It was consistently and even obtrusively constructive. According to Caird, “the true manner of honoring a thinker is to force oneself to understand him from his own point of view,” and only then “to submit his ideas to as objective an examination as possible.” Thus, he seized on the truths contained in the authors with whom he dealt, and was only incidentally concerned with their errors. One of the results of this, however, was that Caird’s own views are often to be found only indirectly–that is, in his exposition and commentary of the views of others.
Like many other idealists, such as D.G. Ritchie (1853-1903), Caird was concerned to show the relation of evolutionary theory to the development of thought and culture. His first set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Religion (2 volumes, 1893), deals less than his other works with an exposition of the views of other philosophers. These lectures focussed on the possibility of a science of religion and the nature of religion from Greek times, but were especially centered on the development of the Christian faith through to the Reformation. Caird shows the spiritual sense of humanity as at first dominated by the object, but constrained by its own abstractions to swing around so as to fall under the sway of the subject.
In 1904 Caird’s second set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers,appeared. Here, he provides again an evolutionary account of religious conceptions (e.g., the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity) toward a ‘reflective religion’ or theology. The story of Greek philosophy, which Caird considered mainly (but not exclusively) in its relation to theology, was carried from Plato through Aristotle, the Stoics, and Philo, to Plotinus and–in the final lecture–to Christian theology and St. Augustine.
In general, Caird’s views on religion were importantly related to his understanding of ethics, and Caird borrows from Hegel (and Goethe) the ethical idea of self sacrifice, or “dying to live,” which was to have an important role in the work of Bosanquet. Caird consistently emphasized the importance of religion, and that a genuine metaphysics must be able to provide an account of it.
The standard assessment of Caird’s work is:
The IEP desires a newer and more detailed article on Caird.
Revised by William Sweet
Last updated: July 14, 2006 | Originally published: