One can scarcely imagine a figure with a greater reputation for disapproval of philosophy than John Calvin. The French expatriate penned some of the most vitriolic diatribes against philosophy and its role in scholastic theology ever written. Thus, in one way, this reputation is rather well-earned, and an article upon Calvin in an encyclopedia of philosophy can be rather brief. However, in another way, Calvin’s consideration, knowledge, and use of philosophy in his own work refutes the obscurantist representation left by a surface-level reading. A closer reading of Calvin’s great work, the Institutes of the Christian Religion, along with his commentaries and treatises demonstrates that instead of denying the importance of philosophy, Calvin generally seeks to set philosophy in what he regards as its proper place. His vehemence stems from his belief that the rationalism of some of the scholastics had displaced God’s wisdom, most securely found in the work of the Holy Spirit in the scriptures, as the pinnacle for knowledge of the divine.
John Calvin, (1509-1564) was born in Noyon, the son of a notary, Gerard Cauvin, and his wife, Jeanne LeFranc. Although Calvin’s father displayed no particular piety, his mother is recorded as having taken him to visit shrines, and on one such occasion he is supposed to have kissed a fragment of the head of St. Ann. Calvin was the fourth of five sons in a family that was definitely not of the aristocracy. Normally, this would have worked against his chances of receiving a thorough education,but through the good fortune of his father’s professional relationship to a family of the local nobility, he received a private education with that family’s children. Having distinguished himself at an early age, Calvin was deemed worthy of receiving the support of a benefice, a church-granted stipend, at the age of 12, so as to support him in his studies. Although normally benefices were granted as payment for work for the church, either present or in the future, there is no record that Calvin ever performed any duties for this position. Later on he held two more benefices, for which he also did no work. Thus supported by the Church, at age 14, Calvin was enrolled at the College de la Marche in the University of Paris, though he quickly transferred to the College de Montaigu.
In Paris, Calvin first came into contact with the new humanistic learning while preparing for a career as a priest,. Though all the contacts which Calvin made cannot be traced, it seems clear that he met many of the leading humanists of his day. Calvin earned his masters degree at the age of 18. However, he did not proceed with his original plan to prepare for a clerical career. Gerard Cauvin, recently excommunicated in a dispute with the cathedral chapter at Noyon, ordered his son to enroll instead at Orleans in the law faculty. Calvin obeyed, and applied himself, finishing his doctorate in law sometime before 14 January 1532. In that same year, his first published book appeared, a commentary on Seneca’s De Clementia. Significantly, it contains no overt evidence of an awareness of, let alone a preoccupation with, the contemporary events in the religious world.
Around 1533, Calvin experienced a “subita conversione,” a sudden conversion. As Calvin is notoriously reticent about revealing his personal life, his writings do not grant much insight as to the exact time or cause of this event. Ganoczy relates it to the prosecution of Cop for heresy, during which Calvin fled Paris, and at which time his apartment was searched and his papers confiscated. In any case, on May 4, 1534, he appeared in Noyon, and surrendered his clerical benefices. Probably from that point on, Calvin no longer had a personal attachment to the church of Rome.
Writing rapidly, Calvin finished the first edition of his Institutes of the Christian Religion in 1536. It enjoyed a wide popular demand, and the original supply was exhausted within a year. Instead of simply reprinting it, Calvin revised it, and the edition of 1539 expanded substantially the original work. This would be Calvin’s pattern throughout the subsequent Latin editions of 1543, 1550, and 1559. French editions were printed in 1545 and 1560, and Calvin’s French is easily as influential as Luther’s German for the formation of the modern vernacular. Each Latin edition was a rearrangement of earlier material, as well as the addition of new components. If this had been the sole gift from Calvin’s pen, it might seem enough. But Calvin also wrote commentaries on almost every book of the Bible, issued numerous tracts, and preached almost every day in Geneva.
Geneva was to be Calvin’s triumph and tribulation. In 1536, Guillaume Farel shamed Calvin into sharing the leadership of Geneva. This period of Calvin’s life lasted until the city council threw him out in April of 1538. Calvin was too rigid for their taste. He settled in Strasbourg, and pastored a congregation. It was here that he began his other life work: commenting upon the books of the Bible. Beginning with the Romans commentary, written at least partially and published in Strasbourg in 1540, Calvin would comment upon most of the books of the scripture. However, Geneva called him back in 1541. Calvin, believing that Geneva was his particular call, returned. He was to live there, alternately supporting and berating the council, until his death in 1564. It was in this period that Calvin made his other great contribution to the Church, preparing, and then forcing the city council to ratify, his Ecclesiastical Ordinances of the Church of Geneva. In this, all the principles of Reformed polity are found. In 1564, debilitated by a series of illnesses, Calvin died in Geneva. By the terms of his will, he was buried in an unmarked grave, so as to avoid any possibility of idolatry.
Calvin’s thought is marked by a constant dialectic between the perspective of a wholly pure and good creator (God) and the corrupted created being (humanity). His anthropology and soteriology shows his dependence on Augustine, with the will being somewhat limited in human application, and powerless to effect change in its status vis-à-vis salvation. However, Calvin balances that with a hearty emphasis on human response to God’s love and mercy in the created order, by correct action both in the human world and the world of nature.
Given Calvin’s occasional antipathy for philosophers, it is all too tempting to dismiss him as someone who knew very little philosophy, striking out at that which he did not know. However tempting that may be, it simply is untrue. In the Institutes, his treatises, and the commentaries, Calvin continually demonstrates a familiarity with both general and specific philosophical knowledge which seems to have been gained through his own study of their writings. What seems most significant about Calvin’s use of philosophy is that in general, he refuses to accept a philosophical system. Instead, he considers philosophy as the history of human wisdom’s attempt to search out answers to the questions of human existence. Thus, philosophers and their theories become paradigms for consideration, rather than structures for the organization of thought.
Hence, Calvin’s effort at using philosophy must be understood as part of his humanism, rather than a tool of the coherence of systematization of his thought. Calvin placed logic in the curriculum of the Genevan Academy. He could illustrate faith with the four-fold causality of Aristotle. He can use the thoughts of the philosophers as aids to training the mind, and believed that not many pastors, and certainly no doctor of the church could be ignorant of philosophy. However, that respect lived in constant tension with his irritation at the efforts of philosophy (and philosophers) at exceeding their proper place.
As noted, Calvin can seem overly harsh about philosophy. Concerning the knowledge of God, Calvin states that it is at this point that it becomes clear “how volubly has the whole tribe of philosophers shown their stupidity and silliness! For even though we may excuse the others (who act like utter fools), Plato, the most religious of all and the most circumspect, also vanishes in his round globe.” (Institutes of Christian Religion I.v.11) Calvin finds that even the most wise philosophers do not compare to the “sacred reading,” which has within itself the power to move the very heart of the reader. (ICR I.viii.1) The power of the scripture is that it carries the gospel, ensured by the Holy Spirit’s presence, so that its words can transport the soul. God’s purpose, Calvin states, in the scriptural teaching of his infinite and spiritual essence, is to refute even subtle speculations of secular philosophy. (ICR I.viii.1) Even those who have attained the intellectual first rank, cannot reach the eminence which is natural to the Gospel. (Commentary on I Corinthians 2.7).
However, Calvin is not anti-philosophical, hating the works of philosophers and philosophy in general. If so, would he have required logic in the Genevan Academy? Rather, he wished to turn the question of wisdom and philosophy clearly towards obedience to Christ. Thus, in the commentary on I Corinthians, Calvin writes that
“For whatever knowledge and understanding a man has counts for nothing unless it rests upon true wisdom; and it is of no more value for grasping spiritual teaching than the eye of a blind man for distinguishing colours. Both of these must be carefully attended to, that (1) knowledge of all the sciences is so much smoke apart from the heavenly science of Christ; and (2) that man with all his shrewdness is as stupid about understanding by himself the mysteries of God as an ass is incapable of understanding musical harmony.”
The interesting point about this passage is that Calvin is neither denigrating human philosophy, nor human reason. He is, rather, discussing what the true purpose of that knowledge or understanding should be, and what the real foundation of human knowledge is. Here, Calvin is not moving back to an Aristotelian self-evident principle; his foundation is instead true wisdom. For Calvin, the phrase “true wisdom” (vera sapientia) hearkens immediately to the beginning sentence of the Institutes. (ICR I.i.1) It was that basis of “true and sound wisdom” (vera ac solida sapientia) which Calvin was seeking, the only place from which epistemology could be safely grounded. Reason, and the fruits of reason, have their place. However, that place does not command a privilege over revealed wisdom.
This instrumental view allows Calvin to give high praise to the fruits of reason. Human reason can even occasionally ascend to consider the truths which are more properly above its grasp, but cannot provide the necessary controls to make sure that its investigations are carefully and correctly considered. “Reason is intelligent enough to taste something of things above, although it is more careless about investigating these.” (ICR II.ii.13). Calvin divides reason, giving it various depths of penetration according to its subject matter. He could write “this then, is the distinction: that there is one kind of understanding of earthly things; another of heavenly. I call ‘earthly things’ those which do not pertain to God or his Kingdom, to true justice, or to the blessedness of the future life; but which have their significance and relationship with regard to the present life and are, in a sense, confined within its bounds.” (ICR II.ii.13)
Thus, Calvin is simply fulfilling his own division when he comments from I Corinthians 3 that “The apostle does not ask us to make a total surrender of the wisdom which is either innate or acquired by long experience. He only asks that we subjugate it to God, so that all our wisdom might be derived from His Word.” (Commentary on I Corinthians 3.18). Calvin is wishing, quite explicitly, to consider the various arts as maid-servants. He cautions against making them mistresses.
There can be no doubt that Calvin made this move for at least two reasons. The first is that for Calvin, the effects of sin are far more drastic than for some other Christian thinkers. Sin has corrupted not only the will, but also the intellect. After the introduction of sin into the world, human possibility is radically limited, and no un-aided intellect, not even the sharpest, will be able to penetrate into the mysteries of God’s truth and God’s current will for humanity.
As important as that insight is another which many have failed to grasp. Calvin’s theology involves a radical notion of God’s accommodation to human capacity, or more truly, human frailty. Even before the Fall, humans were only able to know God because of God’s self-disclosure; humans were only able to please God because of God’s prior guidance in the form of rules. There was never a moment when humans were able truly to initiate either the knowledge of God or the movement toward God. That is immeasurably more true after the establishment of sin in the world, and its effects. Calvin thus dismisses all efforts at going beyond the scriptures (and a great deal of classical metaphysics), as pure speculation, both wrong and sinful.
Perhaps strangely, Calvin’s legacy on the subordinate position of philosophy in the search for divine truth is neither clear, nor lasting. During his own lifetime, Genevan theologians such as Theodore Beza were far more sanguine about grasping the tools of scholastic theology and philosophy, and seem to have been moving away from that hierarchy upon which Calvin insisted. Within the next century, some of the foremost Protestant scholastic theologians would teach at the Genevan Academy, or at least have their ideas taught there.
A modern theological and historiographical struggle exists over what that change entails, and what its significance must be. Some, like Brian G. Armstrong, have argued that this shift towards scholastic models of thought represent an inevitable shift in the content of Reformed theology, and thus a falling away from Calvin’s theological project. Others, notably Richard Muller, have contended that there was not an original time without scholastic theology, and that scholastic method is content neutral. In any case, what is clear is that by the mid-17th century, the caution which Calvin so frequently expressed about the use of philosophy, had been lost. With its loss came the loss of Calvin’s distinctive appropriation of philosophy.
R. Ward Holder
Assistant Professor of Theology
St. Anselm College
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 17, 2005 | Originally published: