Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Carneades (c. 214–129 BCE)

carneadesCarneades was perhaps the most prominent head of the skeptical Academy in ancient Greece. Following the example of Arcesilaus, who turned the Academy in a skeptical direction, Carneades developed an array of arguments against the dogmatic positions upheld by other philosophers, particularly the Stoics. He went beyond Arcesilaus in several respects, however. Instead of simply arguing against the positive positions of other philosophers, Carneades also set forth arguments of his own in favor of views that sometimes had never been defended before–not in order to establish their truth, but simply to counterbalance the arguments of the dogmatists and show that none of their conclusions can be conclusively established. In doing so, Carneades made important contributions to several philosophical debates. Carneades also set forth a more detailed skeptical criterion of what to believe, to pithanon which means either the “plausible” or the “probable.”

Table of Contents

  1. Skeptical Practice
  2. Contributions to Philosophical Debates
  3. Practical Criterion: To Pithanon

1. Skeptical Practice

Carneades continued the skeptical academy’s attack upon Stoic epistemology. Arcesilaus had argued against Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, that no sense-impressions could provide a firm foundation for knowledge, since sense-impressions are always fallible. Carneades maintained this criticism against refinements in the Stoics’ theory made by Chrysippus, the head of the Stoa at his time. But Carneades went beyond criticizing the arguments of other philosophers by trying to propound equally convincing arguments for incompatible conclusions, which would have the effect of leaving his interlocutor suspending judgement as to which is true. For instance, while on a mission to Rome with the heads of two other philosophical schools, Carneades gave an eloquent defense of traditional views on justice one day, and the next day offered an equally eloquent attack on those same views. (Unamused traditionalist Romans expelled the philosophers from the city as a result.)

2. Contributions to Philosophical Debates

In arguing for contrary positions, Carneades sometimes came up with novel positions or arguments. For instance, Carneades gave a taxonomy of different possible candidates for what the highest good could be, and in so doing, came up with possibilities not canvassed by previous philosophers. He also defended original views in the debate between the Stoics and Epicureans on human freedom, determinism, and the truth-values of statements about the future. Against both Epicurus and the Stoics, Carneades argued that no deterministic consequences follow from the principle of bivalence (the principle that for any statement P, either P is true or P is false). That is because, even if it has always been true that e.g., I will brush my teeth tomorrow, that does not imply that there are “immutable eternal causes” which will bring it about that I will do so. It can be true now simply in virtue of the fact that brushing my teeth is actually what I will freely choose to do. Similarly, Carneades said that Epicureans can defend human freedom from causal determinism without positing a random atomic swerve. A person can be the cause of his actions by a “free movement of the mind”, without there being antecedent causes that necessitate that the agent will do what he does. This is reminiscent of the theories of “agent-causation” later propounded by writers like Chisholm.

3. Practical Criterion: To Pithanon

Carneades also developed a detailed skeptical criterion, to pithanon–which can mean either “the plausible” or “the probable.” Sense-impressions can never be a sure guide to truth, thought Carneades, but some are still more convincing to us than others–some seem plausible, and others not. We need not stop there however–we can make further investigation of convincing impressions to see if they stand up or not, as well as seeing whether they cohere with our other sense-impressions.

Exactly how to understand Carneades’ criterion was controversial even in his own day. Carneades left no writings, other than a few letters, and Clitomachus, who was Carneades’ closest associate and succeeded him as head of the Academy, said he did not know what Carneades really thought. Two questions are: (1) Are pithanon beliefs supposed to be more likely to be true (as Cicero and Philo thought), or simply more plausible to the person who accepts them? (2) Is Carneades advocating to pithanon in his own voice as a criterion that a skeptic could use, or is he simply employing it in service of his arguments against the Stoics, without being committed to it himself?

For more information on Carneades, see the section on him in the entry on ancient Greek skepticism.

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Last updated: January 8, 2002 | Originally published: