Cornelius Castoriadis was an important intellectual figure in France for many decades, beginning in the mid-1940s. Trained in philosophy, Castoriadis also worked as a practicing economist and psychologist while authoring over twenty major works and numerous articles that span many of the traditional philosophical subjects, including politics, economics, psychology, anthropology, and ontology. While his works exhibit a vast range of specialized expertise, his work can be understood broadly as a reflection on the concept of creativity, especially on the opposition of traditional ontology to what he would call the fact of radically creative humanity, and perhaps most importantly, on the dangerous political and ethical consequences of a contemporary world that has lost sight of autonomy, a world that ignores the urgency to give limits or laws to itself.
Influenced by his understanding and criticism of traditional philosophical figures such as the pre-Socratics, Plato, Aristotle, Kant, Fichte, Hegel, Marx, and Heidegger, Castoriadis was also influenced by thinkers as diverse as Sigmund Freud, Max Weber, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Georg Cantor. Castoriadis had dynamic intellectual relationships with his fellow members of Socialisme ou Barbarie (including Claude Lefort and Jean-François Lyotard, among others) as well as with leading figures in mathematics, biology, and other fields.
Perhaps above all, Castoriadis is remembered for his initial support of and later break from Marxism, for his subsequent call for Western thought to embrace the reality of creation in a radical sense, and finally, for his defense of an ethics and politics based on autonomy, or giving the law to oneself, which is never the autonomy of an isolated being but always involves beings who relate to others and are aided by institutional supports. In the end, for Castoriadis the central question of philosophy and the source of philosophy’s importance is its capacity to creatively break through society’s closure and ask what the relevant questions for humans ought to be.
Cornelius Castoriadis was born to an ethnically Greek family living in Constantinople (Istanbul) in 1922. The year was one of the most tumultuous in modern Greek history. Following the First World War, lands granted to Greece at the expense of the Ottoman Empire by the victorious Entente powers were being claimed militarily by Turkish nationalists. As the defeat of the Greek army in the formerly Ottoman territories seemed imminent, Castoriadis’ father relocated the family to Athens, the home of Castoriadis’ mother, when Cornelius was only a few months old. As a result, Castoriadis spent his youth in Athens where he discovered philosophy at the age of twelve or thirteen and engaged in communist youth activities while still in high school. Castoriadis subsequently studied economics, political science, and law while involved in the resistance to the Axis occupation of Greece from early 1941 to late 1944. His Trotskyist camp distanced itself from the pro-Stalinist opposition. During this time he also published his first academic writings on Max Weber’s methodology. Established as a student and teacher, Castoriadis led seminars on philosophers including Kant and Hegel. In 1945 he applied for and won a scholarship to write a philosophy dissertation at the Sorbonne in Paris.
Castoriadis’ plans to write his dissertation on the impossibility of a closed, rationalist philosophical system took second stage to his critical-political activities as he joined the French branch of the Trotskyist party after arriving in Paris in late 1945. He soon became dissatisfied with the group’s attitude toward Stalin, and by 1947 Castoriadis developed his own criticism of the Soviet bureaucracy as manipulative of workers for its own purposes. These ideas led Castoriadis to reconsider the very aims of the revolution and to question the Trotskyist project of nationalization and centralized planning by way of an all-powerful party. Bureaucratic management in Russia, he argued, created a new brand of exploiters who should be criticized and abandoned (Castoriadis Reader 3). Discovering he shared similar views with recent acquaintance, Claude Lefort, the two distanced themselves from Trotskyism.
Castoriadis began two major vocations in 1948. He and Lefort co-founded the journal and political group Socialisme ou Barbarie (Socialism or Barbarism) that focused on criticizing both Soviet bureaucracy and capitalism while, at the same time, developed ideas for other possible organizations of society. The group’s founding statement expressed an interest in a non-dogmatic, yet still Marxist, orientation: on the one hand, the traditional questions Marx raised about workers and social organization would remain important, while on the other hand any commitment to Marxist positions on the issues would remain essentially conditional. Despite internal dissent and membership changes, the group remained partially intact from 1948 to 1966 with a peak involvement of a few dozen members and approximately 1,000 copies produced per issue of the journal. Castoriadis’ leadership and writings helped establish him as an important figure in the political-intellectual field in Paris.
In 1948 Castoriadis also began his work as an economist with the international Organization for European Economic Cooperation (OEEC) with which he would remain until 1970, analyzing short- and medium-term economic status of developed nations. His work with OEEC not only allowed him an income and the possibility of remaining in France until his eventual nationalization, but it also permitted him great insights into the economic situation of capitalist countries and into the functioning of a major bureaucratic organization. Following his employment with OEEC, Castoriadis worked during the 1970s as a psychoanalyst. He finally received an academic position at the École des Hautes Études en Sciences Sociales in Paris in 1979 where he worked until his death following heart surgery in 1997.
Looking back on his time with the Socialisme ou Barbarie group, Castoriadis considered one of his and the journal’s most important contributions to be the concept of workers’ self-management (Castoriadis Reader 1-17). While in his later writings the concept would develop into a theory of autonomy standing independently of the Marxist framework, during the journal years Castoriadis developed his theory of self-management as a modification of or an alternative to Marx’s theory of class struggle, especially in its Stalinist interpretation.
In 1955′s “On the Content of Socialism” (Castoriadis Reader 40-105) Castoriadis, writing under a pseudonym in order to protect himself from deportation as an alien, defined the central conflict of society not in terms of the classical dichotomy between owners and workers, but in terms of a conflict between directors and executants. Contemporary society is split between a stratum of managers who direct workers, and a stratum of workers who do little more apart from their narrow, specialized tasks. Workers then pass information up to the managers and carry out the orders that are passed back down to them. (Notably, the distinction between director and executant coincides with Aristotle’s definitions of master and slave in the Politics and with philosopher Simone Weil’s analysis of contemporary society from as early as 1933). For Castoriadis, in the West and in countries that are generally called “communist” but which Castoriadis would have said were only communist-like, the managerial technician or expert is in the minority, separated from the production process. The managerial technician knows little about the functions subordinate to him- or herself, knows little about surrounding fields and their interrelationship to his or her own field, and nevertheless still directs the production process for the workers. The managerial apparatus, argued Castoriadis, leads to inefficiency, waste, and unnecessary conflict between aloof managers and uninformed workers.
The domination of society by the managerial apparatus can only be surpassed, argued Castoriadis, when workers realize that questions of how to organize society are questions for them and, consequently, assume effective management of their own work situation in full knowledge of the relevant facts. Castoriadis’ emphasis on the importance of knowledge of the relevant facts implies that individuals should work cooperatively, forming workers councils of conditionally elected members. Those members, in a strict reversal of the bureaucratic managerial model, would convene frequently, not in order to make decisions for workers, but in order to express the decisions of the workers and to convey important information back to the workers for the purpose of helping them make their own decisions. In this way, the workers’ council is not a new managerial stratum, it conveys relevant information to workers for their purposes. While Castoriadis did support some form of centralized institution, or assembly of councils, capable of making rapid decisions when needed, such decisions, he argued, would be instantaneously reversible by the workers and workers’ councils.
In the end, Castoriadis contrasted his notion of self-management with individualistic or anarchic ideals, as in capitalist countries (which reject the role of councils, but become heavily bureaucratized in spite of themselves) as well as with centralized bureaucracy, as in the existing communist countries. What currently blocks self-management of work by the workers is not the specialization of workers as such, he argued, but rather the separation of the class of directors who specialize only in the management of others.
Through the 1950s and most evidently by 1959, he developed a largely theoretical critique of Marx’s implicit metaphysics, economic theory, and theory of history.
Like many anti-totalitarian Marxists, Castoriadis initially tried to divorce the negative aspects of twentieth-century communism from the true meaning of Marxism. However, he came to argue that a historical critique of existing communist countries should be, indeed, linked to Marx. Castoriadis thus began to analyze the Soviet Union in essays collected in La Société Bureaucratique (Bureaucratic Society). Focusing on the role of institutions in Soviet society and on the principles underlying their organization, he argued that the contemporary Soviet Union was a society dominated by a militaristic, bureaucratic institution which he called “total bureaucratic capitalism.” In the Soviet Union this institution was a centralized and more unified analogue of the fragmented and less unified institutions of capitalist exploitation in the West. This he called fragmented bureaucratic capitalism (FBC) (Castoriadis Reader 218-238). Arguing that while Marx’s Capital had made headway in the analysis of capitalist exploitation, his work was also an essential element in the formation of the dangerous aspects of total bureaucratic capitalism because Marx’s thinking was itself complicit in the same kind of social imaginary that underpinned both total and fragmented bureaucratic capitalism.
This social imaginary was expressed in Marx’s work as the desire for rational mastery over self and nature. In particular, the social imaginary manifested itself in the attribution of total, controlling power to the capitalist system wherein capitalism has enormous, even total power over humanity—a point on which both Marx and the bourgeois economists agreed. This social-imaginary construct (that is, the attribution of total power to capitalism) led to an excessive desire to gain mastery over the system’s powers, to control its supposed force. Thus the need arose, in the minds of Marx’s followers, for a totalitarian bureaucratic system of control that could theoretically gain mastery over the master (World in Fragments 32-43). However, according to Castoriadis’ analysis, the brutal yet disjointed exploitation found in Western society was not solved or even lessened by a system of control, but was instead rendered more total and crushing. The managerial stratum and the entire bureaucratic class became a unified, oppressive force in itself, pursuing its own interests against the people. Hence, Castoriadis concluded that the efforts of the historically communist countries to gain rational mastery over society and economy are not truly separable from Marxism, they stem from the social imaginary that manifests itself as the desire to gain control of nature and humanity through controlling the supposed total power of capital.
With respect to Marx’s economic analysis in particular, Castoriadis also had criticisms. Indeed, as early as 1959’s, “Modern Capitalism and Revolution,” (Political and Social Writings II 226-315) he had already focused on the method of treating workers as though they were functioning according to capitalism’s own laws. Marx failed to consider the importance of contingent workers’ actions and decisions when it comes to the productivity or non-productivity (in short, the very continuation) of capitalism. In other words, Marx’s analysis of capitalism was too deterministic. Capitalism, somewhat like the managerial stratum of society that Castoriadis had diagnosed in his earlier work on the Soviet Union (Section 1.b) cannot actually sustain itself, just as managers cannot sustain the production process in a company. Rather, capitalism, like the managerial stratum of society, relies on the creativity of workers for its own survival. Workers actions creatively keep the system on its feet (often through improvisation and disobedience of management), and workers are those who can bring it to its knees. People are not subject to capital’s laws as Marx would suggest; they sustain or destroy capitalism itself through their own creative activity, according to Castoriadis. As such, workers’ actions—singularly and collectively—can lead to changes in the laws of the system itself. Their efforts to better their own lives are not fated to dialectically feed back into the system’s own self-perpetuation (or self-destruction).
As a result, Castoriadis found that Marx’s view of history and of capitalism’s place in it were similarly based in flawed assumptions. One of many factors contributing to history’s course, the actions of workers, cannot be explained by the historical dialectic. Workers themselves could determine the law of history rather than being determined by history’s law. As such, the classical Marxist theory of capitalism necessitates collapse into socialism and then communism could not be sustained. While Castoriadis agreed with Marx (and praised Marx’s far-reaching analysis) that the history of capitalism is indeed insecure and ridden with crises and so-called contradictions, he disagreed with Marx’s deduction of future historical developments. The outcomes of capitalist crises are determined by how individuals and society take up those crises, not by any necessary internal self-development of capitalism itself.
Castoriadis developed a wholly different view of how autonomous society could arise. Autonomous society, he argued, is a singular and collective creation: it cannot be deduced or developed from tendencies, potentialities, impossibilities, or necessities contained within the system of productivity that is capitalism. Whereas Marx interpreted the workers’ struggles for autonomy as part of the rational self-development of capitalism itself, which would ultimately culminate in capitalism’s collapse. Castoriadis, by contrast, emphasized the real contingency of the historical successes of democratic-emancipatory struggles. These struggles had preceded capitalism, were subdued within capitalism and the modern era of rational mastery, and are still largely subdued in the contemporary age of total and fragmented bureaucratic capitalism (World in Fragments, 32-43). Marxism thinks of itself as supporting the project of human emancipation; but, in its dogmatic form, it confuses this legitimate project with an opposed project: the characteristically modern drive toward rational mastery, that is, the desire to gain mastery over the powerful forces that supposedly control humanity and history.
Between the end of Socialisme ou Barbarie in 1966 and the publication of L’institution imaginaire de la société (The Imaginary Institution of Society) in 1975, the tenor and the explicit subject matter of Castoriadis’ work changed noticeably. For the remainder of his life he engaged critically with multiple disciplines, including psychoanalysis, biology, sociology, ecology, and mathematics. His views were almost always linked to his theory of the creative imagination—both singular and collective—and to its implications for the various disciplines. Indeed, his eventual understanding of being as creation led him to emphasize the imperative for philosophy to be a self-critical project. Philosophy must be able, he argued, to break through institutional and collective closure of society and individuals in order to make possible a deliberative attitude concerning the very goals, ends, and capacities of society and individuals themselves. In developing these views, Castoriadis never worked in a vacuum, as he participated in several groups during this time, including the École Freudienne de Paris led by Jacques Lacan, the journal Textures (primarily philosophical), and the journal Libre (primarily political) with Claude Lefort.
While the first division of L’institution imaginaire de la société was a modified version of his criticism of Marxism, the second division contained a full-scale theory of the creative imagination, both singular and collective. Above all, for Castoriadis, the imagination is not strictly or by any means primarily a capacity to create visual images. Rather, he eventually came to refer to it as a capacity to create forms, that is, the very presentation or self-presentation of being. His theory of the creative imagination developed over many years with different points of emphasis signaled in several essays, often conversant with the philosophical tradition. Importantly, however, it emerged not only in conjunction with his interpretation of the philosophical tradition, but also through his reading of Freud, his dialogue with the sciences and the history of science, and his experience as an analyst.
In 1978’s “The Discovery of the Imagination” (World in Fragments 213-245) Castoriadis distinguished what he called the radical imagination from the traditional view of the imagination. Aristotle’s traditional view depicted in De Anima described the imagination as a burdensome and error-prone faculty that accompanies present sensations but has a tendency to distort them. Since sensations are always true according to Aristotle, this extra imaginary capacity (primarily serving to reproduce what the senses provided, to recombine past sensations into new images, or to supplement sensation confusingly) ended up causing as many problems as it solved―who needs imagination when the senses provide truth? Castoriadis argued that philosophy usually considered this account of imagination to be the truth of imagination tout court. For philosophy (from the Stoics and Augustine, to the Medievals, to Spinoza’s Ethics, and to Sartre’s early works on imagination) the imagination was something that annihilates, disavows, or destroys reality by creating a kind of fantastical non-reality.
Despite this damning picture of the imagination, through his interpretation of De Anima 3.7-3.9, Castoriadis argued that Aristotle himself was actually aware of a more primary imagination that is not simply an accompaniment to sensation or a distorter of truth. Aristotle there suggested that a deeper sense of imagination, a primary imagination, is itself a “condition for all thought.” This primary imagination is not identical to thought, but neither is it a negation of thought. Rather, the primary imagination was a positive other-than-thought that must figure thought. Without the first imagination, there can be no thought. Aristotle’s “first imaginary capacity” should thus be interpreted, Castoriadis argued, as a capacity for the presentation of the real as such, not just for the re-presentation of the real. In this sense, De Anima contains at least references to an imaginary capacity that is different and more primary than the imagination described by Aristotle in most of his works.
Aristotle’s account was too brief and was never understood or elaborated by the philosophical tradition. As an ambiguous figure for Castoriadis, Aristotle raised difficult problems for any account of imagination as strictly negative or re-presentational, and he also failed to draw out the full consequences of his discovery of the first imagination. The rest of Aristotle’s writings and most of traditional philosophy portray the imagination as strictly derivative and reproductive.
According to Castoriadis, Immanuel Kant rediscovered the importance of the imagination and gave philosophy a new awareness of its role (“Logic, Imagination, Reflection,” World in Fragments 246-272). In Critique of Pure Reason, Kant allowed that the imagination is the capacity to present an object even without the presence of that object in intuition. As such, he freed the imagination from the traditional function of accompanying sensation in a posteriori use, that is, the use given to it by Kant’s dogmatist predecessors (Spinoza, Leibniz). For Kant, the imagination was already involved in the initial presentation.
Like Aristotle, Kant was an ambiguous figure for Castoriadis. Castoriadis argued that while Kant was aware of the imagination’s creativity and its vital role in presenting whatever can appear, he was also too quick to re-subordinate the imagination to the task of simply presenting or schematizing the a priori, necessary, and stable structures proper to the subject (that is, concepts and pure forms of intuition). At best, either Kant allowed the imagination a role in a priori mathematical construction in intuition, the forms of which are pre-set for the subject (that is, the form of space and time), or he allowed it to work with the senses but within the framework of these forms of intuitions themselves (that is, within the pre-set structures of space and time). In short, the imagination remained bound to functioning in a pre-established way in Kant’s theoretical work (Castoriadis Reader 319-337) and the same tendency found expression in Kant’s later work on the imagination in the Critique of Judgment (Philosophy, Politics, Autonomy 81-123).
Nevertheless, Castoriadis in some sense followed the Kantian notion that an unknown X, other than the knowing subject, occasions imaginary presentations. Castoriadis preferred, however, to invoke Fichte’s term Anstoß (shock) for the encounter with what occasions imaginary activity. With this shock, the imagination goes into operation and presents whatever comes to be, bringing whatever that which is other into relation to itself and forming the presentation of the other for itself as what it is. While Fichte had suggested that the imagination in some sense gives itself the shock, Castoriadis denied that the question of the internality or externality of the shock was decidable. Thus he maintained that, despite the epistemological undecidability concerning the question of whether subjective or objective constitution of objects is primary, the imagination’s formation of the X leans on (Freud’s term is anaclasis) what is formable in what it forms. Something in what the imagination forms thus lends itself to formation. Of course, there can be no account of this formability without the imagination’s activity of actual formation, but this does not imply that there is nothing formable apart from the imagination’s activity.
Castoriadis’ account did not end with cases in which there is a shock: He argued that the imagination can in some cases just as well begin with nothing at all, thus forming and even creating the formable without any conditioning shock (Castoriadis Reader 323-6). That is, while there are inevitably shocks, the shock is nothing structurally necessary for the imagination’s activity.
Rather than strictly arguing that Kant had failed to recognize something that Castoriadis himself had discovered (that is, the creative imagination), Castoriadis instead argued that Kant had implicitly recognized the creativity of the imagination. Kant’s recognition of the need to chain down the imagination to stable structures of thought and intuition indicated that he was aware that there is a creativity that is not necessarily stable or conservative. If Kant had not recognized the radical creativity of imagination, he would not have been so fervent in his efforts to cover over its radicality by chaining it down to a priori structures. For Castoriadis, we should willingly accept what Kant discovered and recognized, but failed to embrace: radical imaginary creativity.
Castoriadis’ response to Kant’s philosophy, at least in its negative aspects, is not entirely dissimilar to the responses given by the German Idealists: Hegel, Nietzsche, and Heidegger. It differs from post-Kantian idealism and materialism in that it did not involve the monism implicit or explicit in modern idealism (Hegel) and materialism (Nietzsche, Marx). Indeed, perhaps more than any other thinker since Kant, and in opposition to the monistic tendencies of most of the post-Kantians, Castoriadis embraced the inevitability of the encounter with the other―there is no such thing as substance, radically alone. As for twentieth century philosophy, Castoriadis’ account is particularly reminiscent of Heidegger’s (and others’) claim that Kant stepped back from peering into the void of the imagination after having discovered its depths. Still, he did not consider Heidegger to have elaborated a sufficient account of creativity. Castoriadis diverged from most twentieth century philosophy by not turning primarily to language-philosophy (though he did develop a theory of signification in The Imaginary Institution of Society). In contrast to prevalent cultural relativism, he expressed support for the Greek and Enlightenment project of autonomy as a social-historical creation to be valued over heteronymous cultural forms.
What is perhaps most vital for understanding Castoriadis’ creative imagination—what makes his project unique in contemporary philosophy—is that his analysis of creativity is not supposed to entail, by itself, a normative claim. Castoriadis does not assign a positive value to creativity as such. In fact, Castoriadis explicitly rejected the positive valuation of the new for the sake of the new (Post-Script on Insignificance 93-107). The endless search for the next thing or the newest idea in contemporary thought leads to a lack of understanding of the already established norms, and therefore to an unconscious redeployment of those norms. Even so, the radical creativity of the imagination does, in a different way, lead to value-theoretic considerations and, in particular, to a kind of politics. While value considerations cannot be derived from being or creation, the very fact that being is creation does lead to another question—what we can be or what we ought to be. What ought we create (or re-create), institute (or perpetuate), or set for ourselves as a project? How can we provide limits and institutions for ourselves so that we may effectively achieve and call into question what we understand to be good? As such, Castoriadis’ radical imagination might be said to clear the way for his politics and ethics (Section 4).
Castoriadis understood creation as an emergence of newness that, whether deliberate or unconscious, is itself undetermined. He thus described creation as ex nihilo, or stemming from nothing, while also insisting that creation is neither in nihilo nor cum nihilo (Castoriadis Reader 321, 404). In other words, while creation must be understood to result out of nothing and from nowhere, there are relevant conditions at stake in creation. However, even if there were (per impossible) a complete and exhaustive account of such conditions on any occasion of creation, neither the existence nor the specificity of the creation could be fully understood as derived from those conditions. For example, the Greeks created democracy with a set of conditions, such as the linguistic institutions and physical constraints which existed in Athens. However, none of those constraints was strictly determinative of what could occur, nor was the sum of such conditions sufficient to account for the creation of democracy. The creation of democracy, for example, partially broke through some of the conditioning constraints of its society, breaking the closure that tends to prevent individuals in society from questioning their own traditions. In this sense, Greek democracy was radically new.
Since creation is ex nihilo, Castoriadis repeatedly contrasted it with production and deduction. Castoriadis argued, first, that production entails a set of elements or materials is given, which is then molded or modified into a new product. Even notions of self-differentiation are really just notions of productivity in this sense: newness is produced out of something as its self-modification. In either case, Castoriadis argued that the product is a modified version of the same being―it is not what is meant by a new creation. Second, in the case of deduction, he argued that a deductive theory of newness would mean only that there is some new conclusion that follows from a set of factors as a result of there being a determinate rule or law of the deduction process itself (laws of inference, and so forth). Deduction does not create or reveal something new qua new, it involves an inference to something different that is supposed to already exist because its existence follows from the premises. Thus, he argued, both production and deduction are beholden to theories of difference that really only explain modified sameness. Castoriadis contrasted these concepts sharply with creation.
Importantly, Castoriadis’ notion of creation is not equivalent to the epistemic notion of unpredictability, as he clarified in 1983′s “Time and Creation” (World in Fragments 374-401). An emergence of something out of something else can still be fully unpredictable. Unpredictability might, for example, mean simply that not all of the relevant producers, factors, or laws of inference are known or knowable: An unpredictable event or phenomenon could still be determined by unknown factors. Unpredictability could be a function of the limitations of knowledge, thus unpredictability is not equivalent to creation. While Castoriadis agreed that knowers are not, as far as we know, omniscient, he argued that with each creation there emerges something ontologically new, something that is not merely seemingly new “for us” due to some subjective lack of knowledge. Separating radical creation from the merely epistemic notion of unpredictability, Castoriadis defends the notion that creation brings about something genuinely new.
Further, Castoriadis argued that creation does not prevent deterministic accounts from, so to speak, sticking. Creation cannot be simply opposed to determinism; rather creation only excludes the idea that there could be a total inclusion of the various strata of beings (and creations) within “a single ultimate and elementary level” of determination (World in Fragments 393). Thus, Castoriadis did not deny that creations lend themselves to being understood in terms of difference (production, deduction) or determination. Rather, a stratum of explicable difference emerges as a result of the relationship of a creation to those conditions in and with (but not from) which it occurs. For example, while Greek democracy was a radically new creation in history, this creation also re-instituted many of the conditions with which it emerged; in this way, continuities and differences are evident between Greek democracy and its conditions. However, only this stratum of continuity and (mere) difference is explicable in terms of what is producible or deducible from already existing conditions or elements. Castoriadis’ point is that while creation brings with itself, and in itself, a stratum of difference that results from conditioning by institutions and natural limitations, nevertheless, each creation also breaks free from its condition or conditions and brings forth something new.
Finally, Castoriadis’ terminology of the ex nihilo should not be confused with the theological sense of creation ex nihilo. Theological creation, he argued, is really just production by God according to ideas or pre-existing potentialities, such as the nature or mind of God (Fenêtre sur le Chaos 160-164). A God who looks to ideas that always exist, whether those ideas are God’s own (Augustine) or eternal models not identical to god (Plato), is not thought of as a creative being in Castoriadis’ sense. Theological creation, in particular, says creation is a completed affair that might play itself out in interesting ways, but lacks a rigorous sense of newness. Traditional solutions to the theodicy problem—whether they involve a God who continually creates the world according to general laws (Malebranche) or a God who creates pre-packaged monads (Leibniz)—always posit that God has a plan established in advance when he creates the world “once and for all.” At its most extreme point, theological creation is in fact coincident with the most radical necessitarianism and denies that there can be anything radically new (Spinoza), leading Castoriadis to quip that “spiritualists are the worst materialists” (Fenêtre sur le Chaos 161).
Castoriadis’ interest in psychoanalysis became more marked during the years following the end of Socialisme ou Barbarie. He became involved with the L’Ecole Freudienne de Paris (EFP) of Jacques Lacan and was also married for a time to psychoanalyst Piera Aulagnier. In addition to the influence of philosophers, Castoriadis’ ensuing account of the imagination was most deeply influenced by his reading of Freud and his eventual practice and dialogue with other psychoanalysts.
With respect to Freud, Castoriadis was not particularly interested in his traditional understanding of the Phantasie (imagination) which resembled the passive and reproductive imagination (rather than the primary imagination) of the Aristotelian tradition (Section 3.a.1). Rather, he focused on Freud’s search for the deeper origins of Vorstellungen, or representations, especially in the writings from 1915 (World in Fragments 253). Castoriadis was particularly intrigued by the way that Freud’s investigations led (implicitly, but not explicitly) to the conclusion that, for the human psyche, there is no strictly functional apparatus that converts bodily drives into psychical representations. In Castoriadis’ view, Vorstellungen could not be accounted for strictly in terms of physical drives or states. Castoriadis radicalized the notion of an irreducible source of representations, calling this original source of representations the monad, or the monadic pole of the psyche.
Castoriadis’ invocation of the term monad stems, first of all, from the Greek term for unity or aloneness. The term was most famously re-employed by Leibniz to describe the simple, invisible, and sole kind of metaphysical constituent of reality. Leibniz argued that nothing enters or leaves a monad, and yet monads have seemingly interactive experiences due to their pre-established coordination, created by God (the best possible world). For Leibniz, each monad reflects the state of the other monads and harmonizes with them while remaining independent. Invoking Leibniz’s metaphysics, Castoriadis retained the term but gave it a different sense and value. The monad, for Castoriadis, is not the sole kind of metaphysical constituent but neither is it unreal or ineffectual; rather, the monad is that aspect of the psyche that is incapable of accepting that it itself is not the sole kind of metaphysical constituent. As such, while no monad actually remains entirely immanent to itself—since, for Castoriadis, all monads are inevitably fractured when the psyche encounters otherness―the now-fragmented monad generates a tendency or desire to recover itself into a now-impossible state of total aloneness. On the one hand, the monad’s desire for such a total self-enclosure leads the psyche to disregard the non-psychical sources of human function. The psyche begins to hate and despise the body, sometimes detrimentally. On the other hand, the monad’s strife toward unity is not simply a negative thing since it leads the psyche to find unique ways to individuate itself. This individuation often occurs through the psyche’s adoption of social norms. Adoption of norms is not necessarily a bad thing, especially insofar as it can bring a certain measure of stability to the psyche. Castoriadis’ main point was that while the monadic pole of the psyche always tends toward radical aloneness, the psyche as such—which is broader than the monadic pole—is in fact capable of relating to others, of adopting social roles as mediation for its relations to others.
Ultimately, Castoriadis’ need to account for the aspect of the psyche that always strives for unity and aloneness stemmed from his experience as an analyst and from his observations and interaction with patients. In fact, he posits the monad as a necessary hypothesis in order to describe the subsequent observable history that follows from its inevitable fragmentation (Figures of the Thinkable 168). What follows fragmentation is a phase of life in which the psyche creates itself in relation to a specific social-historical situation and the conditions it faces. Castoriadis emphasizes that imaginary creation is never simply or primarily individual affairs, for individuals are fabricated through their social-historical relations and through existing institutions. Thus, in the same way that singular psychic creativity as such is broader than, and precedes, the social-historical individuation of the psyche, so too is there a ground of social-historical creativity itself that is irreducible to individual psychic creativity. Castoriadis refers to this ground as the anonymous collective, which is a trans-individual creativity that is only subsequently transformed into the narrower category of what we mean by society. In this sense, Castoriadis insisted that various strata of creativity—for example, the psyche and the anonymous collective—are irreducible to each other and yet interactive.
In this way, Castoriadis sought to develop a trans-individual, social-historical account of being and creativity along with his account of the psyche. He therefore reformulated the very goals of psychoanalysis accordingly. Following from his account of the monad, he suggested that psychoanalysis itself should be given the new task of helping the psyche to break consciously and lucidly with the monadical desire for total closure. Castoriadis felt that this at once psychoanalytical and philosophical task could help bring about a world where the singular psyche and the anonymous collective creativity yield an autonomous society characterized by deliberative activities of self-creation (Section 4).
In addition to his reflection on social and individual human creativity, Castoriadis also developed views about non-human living beings. In “The State of the Subject Today” (World in Fragments 137-171), he considered in turn the living being, the psyche, the social individual, and finally human society, arguing that each is a distinct but interactive stratum of being. While a living being (for example, a human) is conditioned by its interaction with and dependency on other living beings such as cells, no stratum of living beings (such as humanity) is reducible to any other stratum. Human life cannot be conceived as merely an expression of cell life or physical processes. While humans can organize and modify other living beings in some ways, humans are not models for other forms of life. As such, any given stratum of living beings is neither reducible to nor producible from another stratum. Rather, each stratum is itself, according to Castoriadis, a unique kind of living being, or for itself, which leans on but is by no means determined by, the other strata with which it interacts.
Beginning at the cellular level then, Castoriadis described the living being as creative of its own proper world as it leans on other beings and worlds which lend themselves. Castoriadis suggested, for example, that an individual dog is a participant in the species dog, in the sense that this dog creates for itself a world in common with other dogs. Nevertheless, while the proper worlds of the cells of this dog (or of other beings in its environment) are a condition of this dog and of its creation of a proper world, they are not something out of which this dog emerges or with which its life is always entirely consistent. Dog cells do not determine the proper world of a dog although they are conditions leaned upon by this dog as it creates its own proper world. While dog-life thus depends on cell-life, the stratum of life proper to dogs is a creation of dogs as they live with their cells. And, of course, cell life is also creative of a proper world only partially analogical with others. As a result, no living being’s world is a mere example of another stratum. A human, for example, could not adequately or exhaustively project its world upon another stratum. Thus, humanity cannot be wholly or even mostly consistent with the proper worlds of all other living beings, even if it can be and even must be consistent with some of them in some ways.
On this level, Castoriadis conversed with Chilean biologist and proponent of the theory of autopoiesis Francisco Varela (for example, see “Life and Creation” in Post-Script on Insignificance). For Varela, and also for Humberto Maturana, auto-creation means that each living being creates for itself a world of closure―the living being is essentially dependent upon the living beings which condition it. Higher beings are expressions of the lower constituents. Castoriadis followed Varela with respect to the self-creation of the living being and its proper world, arguing that nothing enters into the proper world of a living being without being transformed by it. However, for Castoriadis, auto-creation did not have to entail a kind of organizational closure since some living beings are both radically creative of new, irreducible strata of life and merely lean on others for their creations; they are not simply expressions of those other strata. The creativity of living beings is thus irreducible to being the expression of the conditions of the living being, whether that expression is internal, external, environmental, and so forth. Even the most basic stratum (which Castoriadis called the first natural stratum) is merely a condition for other living beings, not something that decides or produces what those other strata are.
Castoriadis did not treat the creativity of the living being as simply a larger or smaller scale version of other living beings. The human creation of a proper world, for example, creatively breaks out of a closure relative to its supporting conditions and breaks continuity even with itself at times. Humans create a new stratum of being irreducible to the others but are always intra- and inter-active with other strata. The human psyche creates in ways that are not contained potentially in anterior states of other living beings or in its inherited conditions―humans create a new, distinct stratum of life. Thus, while Castoriadis argued from a biological standpoint that it is quite possible to truly affirm that everything interacts, he insisted that we cannot for that reason “simply say that everything interacts with everything […]” (Post-Script on Insignificance 67). All of what is proper to the human world interacts with some other strata, but only some of what is proper to the human world has analogues in other strata.
Castoriadis’ project has many aspects that allow it to be interpreted as a theory of being in the traditional sense. He developed two important theoretical concepts that underpin much of his ontological work beginning in the 1970s: magmas and ensembles. The former term was Castoriadis’ preferred name for indeterminate, or mixed, being. The latter, the French term for sets, is his term for determinate being (where being refers to either the singular or plural).
Castoriadis faced his greatest difficulties in describing magmas since he argued magmas exist and yet they are not comprehensible by traditional ontology because traditional ontology thinks that true being is strictly determinate. Traditional ontology says that what is indeterminate (Greek apeiron) is a more or less deficient being or a kind of non-being. That is, indeterminate being is at best conceived as existing only insofar as it is related to determinate being (Greek peras). Castoriadis’ task was to envision magmas without thinking of magmas as merely existing relative to, or as negations of, determinate being. As such, Castoriadis made a very cautious effort to define magmas (although he did not consider his task to be possible in this definitional form) in a way that did not define them as deficient modes of determinate being. In the 1983 text, “The Logic of Magmas and the Question of Autonomy,” (Castoriadis Reader 290-318) he suggested several propositions:
M1: If M is a magma, one can mark, in M, an indefinite number of ensembles.
M2: If M is a magma, one can mark, in M, magmas other than M.
M3: If M is a magma, M cannot be partitioned into magmas.
M4: If M is a magma, every decomposition of M into ensembles leaves a magma as residue.
M5: What is not a magma is an ensemble or is nothing.
Here the central problem in thinking about magmas is the way that they appear as a great nexus wherein any magma is inseparable from any other magma. Magmas are thus something like mixtures of beings that involve no totally separate or discrete elements. Even so, other magmas, different from any particular magma that is being researched, can indeed be indicated as existing within the magma being researched. For this reason, magmas are also not simply one sole entity. In short, magmas are inherently indeterminate; while they are determinable in some ways, they are never wholly determinate.
As for his account of ensembles, or determinate being, Castoriadis argued that all traditional ontology—including Platonic forms, Aristotelian substance, Kantian categories, the Hegelian absolute, for example―assumes that being is essentially determinate. Such an ontology is, in Castoriadis’ terms, an ensemblist-identitarian, or ensidic, ontology. These ontologies always rely on certain operators of thinking, including traditional logical and mathematical principles such as the principle of identity, non-contradiction, the excluded third, and so forth. They assume that being consists of entirely discrete or separate elements that neatly conform to these principles. Ensidic thought therefore cannot grasp the notion that there would be anything genuinely other than determinate being.
As an example of ensidic thought, Castoriadis preferred to invoke the history of set theory and its development. Cantor described a set as “any collection into a whole M of definite and separate objects m of our intuition or our thought,” he expressed explicitly what all later (non-naive or axiomatic) versions of set theory would maintain as an implicit pre-assumption about what being is and must be: being is wholly determinate or consists of wholly determinate elements. When Cantor’s original set theory was shown to lead to paradoxes (such as Russell’s paradox), later axiomatic set theory did not call into question Cantor’s core pre-assumption that all being is determinate. Instead, it attempted to salvage Cantor’s determinacy assumption by wagering on being’s conformability to the determinacy assumption, all while searching for better ways to make that assumption consistent. Axiomatic set theory thus unquestioningly accepted and reaffirmed Cantor’s original presupposition as it attempted to salvage set theory through axiomatics. Nevertheless, set-theoretic ontology is not unique or special in its assumption of the total determinacy of being. Everyday language, for example, already implicitly posits the separation and distinctness of beings. Set-theoretical ontology re-confirms this bias of everyday language when it attempts to guarantee for itself that all being is determinate.
The problem with the assumption that all being must be determinate, or ensidic, Castoriadis argued, is not that there is in truth no stratum of determinate being whatsoever. Rather, there is such a stratum of wholly determinate being. The problem is that while this stratum is a condition for other beings, it is merely a condition, not the sole constitutive principle of the other strata of being. The assumption that all being must be determinate leads ensidic logic to present some stratum of being (the first natural stratum of sheer determinacy) as if it were solely constitutive of each and every stratum of being (or each and every being). As such, a wholly ensidic ontology wrong assumes that this de facto condition of determinacy is itself universally constitutive in principle of all possible beings. It falsely assumes that other strata simply re-confirm and conform to the ensidic strata (or stratum) of being. In reality, it itself posits this stratum of being as primary, without the attendant awareness that this hypothesis is a hypothesis. Thus, traditional ontology, like everyday language, gravely mistakes the ensidic stratum itself for what being must be.
For Castoriadis, the psyche of each human is inevitably fragmented and cannot remain in a strictly monadic state (Section 3.b.i). Further, the creativity of the anonymous collective, as the ground of social-historical constellations of meaning, is irreducible to individual psychic creativity. Thus, the question of the political (la politique) arises necessarily for humans because humans must create themselves as they exist in relation to others and in relation to society’s institutions (which often mediate relations with others). Therefore, the question of true political action is intimately linked to the question of which institutions we shall institute, internalize, and lean on in our creations. We form ourselves with others as we relate to these institutions. Hence, we must engage in lucid deliberation about what is good for humans and about which institutions help us achieve the good. This is what separates the political from mere politics, according to Castoriadis.
Importantly, genuine deliberation does not merely concern the means to achieving a goal that we already presuppose that we know (as Aristotle had supposed in Ethics that our goal is happiness and that we only need to deliberate about the means to happiness). Rather, we must deliberate about the ends themselves as well as the means. As such, political existence can never arrive at a total, final conclusion. Since no set model of action is given to us (for example, politics cannot be modeled on what is natural or ecological, in accordance with evolution, and so forth), society cannot assume that any given condition or state of life determines which laws it should lay down for itself and which practices it should support or sanction. Rather, for Castoriadis, the political is a way of life in which humans give the laws to themselves as they constantly re-engage in deliberation about what is good. In short, the political coincides with the question, and the ability of individuals and society to pose the question, what is a good society? Societies and individuals who pose this question are capable of autonomy, transcending the closure of the traditions and social conditioning from which they come. This capacity for autonomy depends not only on the individuals and society who actually give limits and laws to themselves, but also on those institutions on which individuals and society lean when posing those laws.
In 1989’s, “Done and To Be Done,” (Castoriadis Reader361-417) Castoriadis restated some of the political arguments he had developed since his tenure with Socialisme ou Barbarie. He argued that the problem of intellectual traditions covering over the reality of creation (Section 3) is not merely a theoretical issue; it also immediately coincides with closure in political and moral reality. All societies are self-creative and yet most, he argued, are utterly incapable of calling into question their own established norms. In such societies, the de facto situation immediately coincides without remainder with what is of de jure validity for them. Such a society, which does not or cannot question its own norms or considers its norms to be given by God, gods, nature, history, ancestors, and so forth, is heteronymous in opposition to autonomous societies.
Castoriadis argued that heteronomy results when nature, essence, or existence are understood to produce the law for the creative living being, for individuals, or for society. On the one hand, Castoriadis’ definition of heteronomy was not limited to, nor did it target religious beliefs in any special sense, even though Castoriadis’ examples were at times examples of religious beliefs and at other times examples of closed, but not necessarily religious, societies. In this way, the distinction cuts across any supposed divide between sacred and secular, such that even the most seemingly enlightened and anti-religious materialism could be the dominant instituted imaginary in a largely heteronymous society. In such a society, humans are continuously regenerated in a systematic state of closure. The necessary condition for the project of autonomy is, thus, the breaking of such instituted radical closure, that is, the rupture of heteronomy.
On the other hand, what is essential for Castoriadis’ positive account of autonomy, is that there is no law of nature that is pre-set for the human, that is, there is no substance or rule determining what a human qua human must be or can be. However, this is not to say that the human is nothing at all: The creativity of the human means that humans “cannot not posit norms” (Castoriadis Reader 375). As such, humans can always pose and repose the question of norms and of what they are to be. The radical creativity of the psyche is never obliterated by a society or a set of social institutions, even if autonomy is absent. Nevertheless, it is possible for societies and individuals to largely cover over this creativity of the human, to institute norms that cannot be called into question.
As a result, Castoriadis did not identify creation (or self-creation) with autonomy. Rather, even heteronymous societies create themselves and are self-constituting. Autonomy exists only when we create “the institutions which, by being internalized by individuals, must facilitate their accession to their individual autonomy and their effective participation in all forms of explicit power existing in society” (Castoriadis Reader 405). Autonomy means not only that tradition can be questioned―that the question of the good can be posed―but also that we make it possible for ourselves to continue to ask such questions. The latter requires that we establish institutional supports for autonomy.
For Castoriadis there is, therefore, an exigency to embrace autonomy in a sense not limited to the liberal ideal of non-coercive, negative freedom wherein coercion and even society as such is depicted as evil (albeit, a necessary evil). Castoriadis argued that the object of politics is to be capable of positive self-limitation, meaning that autonomy “can be more than and different from mere exhortation if it is embodied in the creation of free and responsible individuals” (Castoriadis Reader 405). Castoriadis argued, against the liberal ideal, that the elimination of coercion cannot be a sufficient political goal, even if it is a good thing. Rather, autonomous societies go beyond the negative-liberty project of un-limiting people. Autonomous communities create ways of explicitly, lucidly, and deliberately limiting themselves by establishing institutions through which individuals form their own laws for themselves and will therefore be formed as critical, self-critical, and autonomous. Only such institutions can make autonomy effective.
In defining what he meant by effective autonomy, Castoriadis distinguished his view of autonomy from Kant’s. In the Kantian perspective, he argued, the possibility of autonomy involves the possibility of acting freely in accordance with the universal law, itself established once and for all, apart from the influence of any other heteronymous incentives. Castoriadis argued that Kantianism treats autonomy itself as a goal or as something that we want simply for itself. Echoing Hegel, Castoriadis argued that Kantian autonomy ends up as a purely formal issue or a desire for autonomy for itself alone. Castoriadis, like Kant, did not deny the importance of the pursuit of autonomy for itself, with the full knowledge that the law of one’s action is not given from elsewhere. However, he added that we do not desire autonomy only for itself but also in order to be able to make, to do, and to institute. The formal, Kantian autonomy must also be made factual. “The task of philosophy,” he argued, “is not only to raise the question quid juris; that is just the beginning. Its task is to elucidate how right becomes fact and fact right—which is the condition for its existence, and is itself one of the first manifestations thereof” (Castoriadis Reader 404). No matter how much autonomy is a goal for itself, it is not something established once and for all, but depends on a constantly renewed task of instituting autonomy. As such, effective autonomy means that the will for autonomy itself as an end must also be a will for the means to autonomy, namely the will to establish the institutions on which effective autonomy leans.
In 1983 “The Greek Polis and the Creation of Democracy” (Philosophy, Politics, Autonomy 81-123), Castoriadis argued that institutions of autonomy have appeared twice in history: in Athens in the fifth century B.C.E. and in Western Europe during the Enlightenment. Neither example serves as a model for emulation in institutions. If we recall that the existence of autonomous institutions is never a sufficient condition for autonomy, we realize that there can be no question of treating historical cases as models to emulate. Rather, what makes these cases important, for Castoriadis, is that they are examples where, within societies that have instituted a strict closure, the closure is nevertheless ruptured, opened, and there is an institution of a radically new nomos, or law, for themselves.
Societies, argued Castoriadis, tend to institute strict closure: “In nearly all of the cultures that we know of, it is not merely that what is valid for each one is its institutions and its own tradition, but, in addition, for each, the others are not valid” (Post-Script on Insignificance 93). However, Castoriadis argued that Greece—in grasping that other societies do not mirror a nature found everywhere, but are radically creative of their own institutions—also thereby grasped themselves as self-creative of their own institutions. The Greeks broke with their own established social closure and instituted lucid self-legislation. The Greek discovery of social self-creation led to the partial realization (institution) of autonomy precisely because they both effectively imagined their potential universality with others as an end (formal autonomy) and yet also established some particular institutions as supports for autonomy’s effective realization.
Although the Greek creation remained partial and its institutions were limited and narrow (for example, they excluded women) Castoriadis’ point was that the potential universality of their creation (radical criticism and self-criticism), which they understood to be their own creation, coincided with the democratic institutions established as supports for rendering autonomy effective. In the end, the Greeks inaugurated a tradition of radical criticism that is, for Castoriadis, always something with which autonomy—and philosophy—begins, even if it is not that from which it can be deduced.
Castoriadis did not shy from suggesting some specific institutions that autonomous societies embrace, although he cautioned that there can be no a priori or final decision about what autonomous society should be. Nevertheless, in “Done and To Be Done” (Castoriadis Reader 361-417), he proposed a classical, three-pronged institutional arrangement of society’s strata. These strata are:
In defining these terms, Castoriadis insisted that the first necessary condition of an autonomous society is the rendering open of the public/public sphere, or ekklêsia. The task is to make self-institution by individuals and society explicit through the public consideration of the works and projects that commit the collectivity and the individual. The ekklêsia is not a sphere of bureaucratic management of individuals by social architects; quite the opposite, it entails the establishment of institutions for knowledge production and lawmaking, thus making possible an intellectual space for individuals to know and question laws in an informed way. Such considerations that effect individuals cannot, however, be left to the private/private or the public/private spheres, they must be undertaken by the collectivity together in that place where the self-institution for both and each occurs together. There seems to be no requirement that the ekklêsia occupy what we commonly call a physical place; rather, the site for knowing, deliberating about, and questioning the law is decidedly something that belongs to all (ta koina). What is important is that ekklêsia involves the collectivity in a public deliberation about the goals and means of society and individuals.
Second, Castoriadis argued that an autonomous society will render the private/private sphere, or oikos, inviolable and independent of the other spheres. Individuals, families, and homes create themselves with institutions: private life itself, as it creates itself, leans on institutions deliberately considered in the ekklêsia, such as the institutions for education, basic criminal law, and other society-wide conditions. Bureaucratic communism or socialism, insofar as they destroy individual personality and private life are to be abolished through the ekklêsia’s efforts to support the independence and distinctness of the private/private sphere.
Third, Castoriadis defended the independence of the public/private, mixed sphere, the agora. His defense of the term the Greeks used for their marketplace has nothing to do with any defense of so-called free enterprise. Rather, the agora is where individuals (and not a particular set of individuals, as was the case in Athens, where men alone participated) can group themselves in relation to others for purposes that are not explicitly questions pertaining to the public/public sphere. The independence of the agora as a mixed sphere would eliminate the possibility of forced collectivization of goods or the need for the abolition of money forms, which are still useful in the agoric sphere. The agoric sphere provides a kind of buffer between the tyrannies of the wholly public or wholly private set of interests, thus supporting autonomy as a whole.
For Castoriadis, no sphere suffices alone: “Autonomous society can only be composed of autonomous individuals” (World in Fragments 416). Each of the three institutional strata should be treated as a proper sphere of its own―they should not be collapsed into one sphere, as did many ancient societies as well as the statist and bureaucratic societies in the twentieth century. On the one hand, statist societies, despite their intentions of establishing a genuine public sphere, constantly collapsed the potential universality of the public/public into a massive, all-inclusive private/private stratum―into a manipulative, bureaucratic society. On the other hand, Castoriadis argued that Western liberal democracies are more properly oligarchic, totalitarian-capitalist societies that happen to exist in a somewhat more fragmented and less total form than their statist counterparts. They, too, tend to collapse the public/public into private, bureaucratic, capitalist companies and, on the other hand, they engender people who do not know the law and therefore cannot question it or institute it for themselves, thus foreclosing autonomy.
John V. Garner
U. S. A.
Last updated: March 30, 2012 | Originally published: