Category Archives: History of Philosophy

Margaret Cavendish (1623—1673)

Margaret Lucas Cavendish, the Duchess of Newcastle, was a philosopher, poet, playwright and essayist. Her philosophical writings were concerned mostly with issues of metaphysics and natural philosophy, but also extended to social and political concerns. Like Hobbes and Descartes, she rejected what she took to be the occult explanations of the Scholastics. Against Descartes, however, she rejected dualism and incorporeal substance of any kind. Against Hobbes, on the other hand, she argued for a vitalist materialism, according to which all things in nature were composed of self-moving, animate matter. Specifically, she argued that the variety and orderliness of natural phenomena cannot be explained by blind mechanism and atomism, but instead require the parts of nature to move themselves in regular ways, according to their distinctive motions. And in order to explain that, she argued for panpsychism, the view that all things in nature possess minds or mental properties. Indeed, she even argued that all bodies, including tables and chairs, as well as parts of the bodies of organisms, such as the human heart or liver, know their own distinctive motions and are thereby able to carry it out. These different parts of nature, each knowing and executing their distinctive motions, create and explain the harmonious and varied order of it. In several ways, Cavendish can be seen as one of the first philosophers to take up several interesting positions against the mechanism of the modern scientific worldview of her time. Thus it is possible to add that she presages thinkers such as Spinoza and Leibniz.

When she turned to discuss political and social issues, Cavendish’s metaphysical commitments seem to remain. Cavendish was a staunch royalist and aristocrat; perhaps not surprisingly, then, she argued that each person in society has a particular place and distinctive activity and that, furthermore, social harmony only arises when people know their proper places and perform their defining actions. She was therefore critical of social mobility and unfettered political liberty, seeing them as a threat to the order and harmony of the state. Even so, her writings also contain nuanced and complex discussions of gender and religion, among a variety of other topics.

Despite her conservative political tendencies, Cavendish herself can be seen as a model for later women writers. She wrote dozens of books, at least five of which alone were on natural philosophy, under her own name, a feat which may make her the most published female author of the seventeenth century and one of the most prolific women philosophers in the early modern period. In addition to writing much on natural philosophy, she wrote on a dizzying array of other topics and, perhaps most impressively, in a wide range of genres. Her philosophically informed poetry, plays, letters and essays are at times as philosophically valuable as her treatises of natural philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Natural Philosophy
    1. Materialism
    2. Vitalism and the Variability Argument
    3. Panpsychism
    4. God
  3. Political Philosophy
    1. Religious Liberty
    2. Royalism and Aristocracy
    3. Gender
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Cavendish’s Works in the 17th Century
    2. Modern Editions of Her Works
    3. Secondary Literature

1. Life and Works

Margaret Lucas was born in 1623 in Colchester into a family of aristocrats and staunch royalists. She received little formal education, being tutored at home with her seven siblings, of which she was the youngest. She reports having spent much time in conversation with one of her brothers, John, who considered himself a scholar and who would become a founding member of the Royal Society. She joined the Queen’s court and served as a maid to Queen Henrietta Maria, following her into exile in 1644, during the English Civil War. While in exile she met William Cavendish, then Marquess and later Duke of Newcastle. They were married in 1645.

While in exile in Paris and Antwerp, she reports discussing philosophy and natural science with her husband and his younger brother, Sir Charles Cavendish, who held a regular salon attended by Thomas Hobbes, Kenelm Digby and occasionally René Descartes, Marin Mersenne and Pierre Gassendi. Margaret herself reports having attended several dinners, at which these philosophers were present, though she denies having spoken to them about any, but the most superficial of matters.

While her husband remained in exile, she returned in 1651 and again in 1653 to England. This was during the reign of Commonwealth, during which her husband, were he to have returned, would have had to renounce his royalism and swear fealty to the Commonwealth, as was required by the republican parliament of the time. The parliament did not extend that requirement to women, claiming that women were not capable of such political acts. Thus Margaret was allowed to return to England without swearing fealty to the Commonwealth.

During her 1653 visit, she arranged for the publication of her first collection of writings, Poems and Fancies and Philosophical Fancies. She reports having delivered the second philosophical treatise a few days too late to have it included with the first in a single publication, which had been her original intention. The publisher was Martin and Allestyre, at the Bell in St. Paul’s Churchyard, which was a well-regarded publisher, who later became the official publisher for the Royal Society. It is truly remarkable that she was able to secure their publication, as few women published philosophy in England in the seventeenth century, much less under their own name and while in exile.

The same publishing house would publish The World’s Olio and Philosophical and Physical Opinions in 1655 and Nature’s Pictures in 1656. The second work of 1655, Philosophical and Physical Opinions, contained five parts and 210 chapters, the first part of which, consisting of 58 chapters, was in fact a reprinting of her earlier Philosophical Fancies. With her 1655 Philosophical and Physical Opinions, she added a number of epistles and her “Condemning Treatise on Atoms” to the front matter and also extended the work beyond the earlier Philosophical Fancies significantly.

With the Restoration of Charles II to the throne, she returned to England with her husband and continued to write. In addition to publishing on natural philosophy, she also wrote essays on a remarkable variety of other topics, including the nature of poetry, the proper way to hold a feast, fame, women’s roles in society and many others. She also wrote many plays and poems, as well as a fantastic utopia, The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World in 1668.

There may have been some controversy over a woman publishing works on natural philosophy, as she felt the need to include several epistles, both from herself and from her husband and brother-in-law, attesting to the fact that she had written these works herself. Indeed, she returns to defend herself as an author and natural philosopher at a number of different places in her work, often in epistles to the reader. She also defends the propriety of her being so bold as to write in her own name and to think her thoughts worthy of publication. Her several discussions of fame are worth noting in this context.

She continued to write on natural philosophy, among other topics, to growing attention. She sent her works to many of the well-known philosophers then operating in England, as well as to the faculties at Cambridge and Oxford.  Indeed, after she had published her most famous work of natural philosophy, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy in 1666, she was invited to attend a meeting of the Royal Society, a privilege rarely granted to women at the time.

In all, she may be the most prolific woman writer of early modern Europe and certainly the most prolific woman philosopher. Depending on how one counts, she published over a dozen and perhaps as many as twenty works, at least five of which are works on natural philosophy and many more contain essays with substantive philosophical content.

2. Natural Philosophy

Cavendish wrote half a dozen of works on natural philosophy. Indeed, natural philosophy constituted the largest part of her philosophical output and a large part of her writing as a whole. Her philosophical commitments can be described as materialist, vitalist and panpsychist. In what follows, her philosophical discussions will be grouped around several recurring themes and arguments.

a. Materialism

Like Hobbes, Descartes or Bacon, Cavendish regularly motivates her position by attacking the Aristotelianism of the schools, mocking those whom her husband calls the “gown-tribe.” She criticized what she took to be their commitment to occult powers and incorporeal beings in nature and offers her materialism as an alternative. She explains that her intent is to provide a philosophical system accessible to all, without special training. From her earliest work, Philosophical Fancies, published in 1653, Cavendish argued for materialism in nature. In the first two chapters of that work, which she reprinted in Philosophical and Physical Opinions in 1655, she claims that nature is one infinite material thing, which she sometimes describes as “the substance of infinite matter” (“Condemning Treatise of Atomes”). This infinite material substance is composed of an infinite number of material parts, with infinite degrees of motion. Similarly, this motion is all of the same kind, differing from instance to instance only in swiftness or direction. In other words, the natural world is entirely constituted by a single type of stuff, which she calls matter and a single force, which she calls motion. She distinguishes the objects and events in nature from one another by the varying parts of matter, bearing different motions, within that one infinite material substance. She explicitly extends this materialist doctrine to the human mind in chapter 2 of the Philosophical Fancies, where she says that the forms of the gown-tribe, as well as human minds, are nothing but “matter moving, or matter moved.” Furthermore, she remained committed to this materialism throughout her career, such as in her Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy first published in 1666, claiming that all actions of sense or of reason are corporeal. Thus we see from the very beginning of her first work that she is a materialist.

The exact nature of her materialism develops over time, however. In her earliest work from 1653, she allows for an atomist account of nature and matter, though by 1656 she is already arguing against atomism in her “Condemning Treatise of Atomes”. Later, in her Observations from 1666, she provides at least two arguments against atomism. First, she argues that the concept of an extended yet indivisible body is incoherent, saying, “whatsoever has body, or is material, has quantity; and what has quantity, is divisible” (Ch. 31, 125); this is an argument that was commonly employed against atomism in the seventeenth century. She also argues that composite bodies, each with their own motions, could not account for the unity of the complex body, but would instead be like a swarm of bees or a school of fish. Atomism, she argues, cannot explain organic unity. She says, “[w]herefore, if there should be a composition of atoms, it would not be a body made of parts, but of so many whole and entire single bodies, meeting together as a swarm of bees...and the concourse of them would rather cause a confusion, than a conformity in nature” (Ch. 31, 129). Instead of atomism, Cavendish proposes that matter is both infinite in extension and always further divisible. Furthermore, for Cavendish, complex beings such as animals are composed of distinctive matter in motion, which she takes to provide them with their unity. Even so, her primary targets are not atomist materialism, as much as both the occultism of the Schools and the mechanism of some of her contemporaries.

She also applies her materialism to the human mind. In her early works, she suggests that there is nothing of the human being that is not material. For example, in her first work, she wrote a brief dialogue between body and mind, in which she claims that the only way the mind can attain any sort of life after the death of the body is by fame, that is, by being thought well of by others. Indeed, she elsewhere claims that "all the actions of sense and reason...are corporeal” and “sense and reason are the same in all creatures and all parts of nature” (Ch. 31, 128), as well as, “knowledge, being material, consists of parts” (Ch. 37, 160).

Cavendish seems to qualify her materialism with regard to the human soul later in her career, when she clarifies that her previously strong and consistent commitment to materialism only applies to the natural world. For example, in Observations, she claims that humans have both a material mind and, in addition, a supernatural, immaterial soul. She argues that the way, in which this supernatural soul is related to the material mind and body is itself supernatural. After all, she suggests, place is a property belonging only to bodies and thus, could not belong to an immaterial soul. Therefore, the way, in which the immaterial soul is related to the material person is itself a supernatural, that is, miraculous phenomenon. Unfortunately, she offers little explanation for this immaterial soul and refrains from explaining whether or how the immortal soul might interact at all with anything in nature, instead implying that it does not. To make matters even more confusing, she seems to amend her view in 1668 when claiming that only God is immaterial and all other things are material. It may be that she had changed her mind as to whether or not human beings have immaterial, supernatural souls, but the texts themselves do not seem to speak definitively.

Throughout her work, however, Cavendish did claim that human beings possess a material soul. She explains the material, natural soul in the same way, in which she explains the mind, through her distinction among the different degrees of motion in matter, as mentioned above. Briefly, she claims that matter may have differing degrees of motion, such that some matter is relatively inert and gross, that is, being composed of larger pieces of matter, which she sometimes calls “dull matter”. In contrast, there is also a finer and more rare matter, which possesses more motion. This faster and lighter matter infuses dull matter. The natural, material, human soul or mind, she explains, is the finer, rarer matter within our grosser, cruder material bodies. Scholars have noted the similarity this view bears to Stoic doctrine, in that the rarer, more quickly moving matter resembles the Stoic pneuma.

Just like the Stoics, she also explicitly states in her later works—and suggests at times in her earlier works—that all bodies are completely infused with varying degrees of this active matter. Indeed, it is this matter that accounts for the regularity of natural phenomena across all of nature. She says that “there can be no order, method or harmony, especially such as appears in the actions of nature, without there be reason to cause that order and harmony” (Ch 6, 207). She claims, for example, that animals possess motions visible externally, such as jumping or running, whereas vegetables and minerals possess and exhibit motions only detectable internally, such as contracting or dilating. She refers to the motions found in animals, vegetables and minerals to varying degrees as sensitive spirits, a term that calls to mind Descartes’ animal spirits. But even minerals and vegetables and also animals and humans possess a further, yet finer and more quickly moving form of matter, which she calls “rational spirits.” These rational spirits are the quickly moving, but rare pneuma-like matter described above, which ultimately explain the various motions and behaviors of the natural objects. Ultimately, though, these motions and the matter they infuse are of the same fundamental kind, differing only in their degree of motion. This view, coupled with her radical claims that “all motion is life” and “knowledge is motion” will lead to her vitalism and panpsychism.

Another of Cavendish’s distinctive commitments about the nature of matter is this: matter bears an infinite degree of motion and, crucially, it bears that motion eternally. In other words, if a bit of matter has a certain degree of motion, according to Cavendish, it cannot lose that degree of motion nor communicate it to another piece of matter. We might say that, for Cavendish, the particular degree of motion that a part of matter bears is essential to that part. Thus, the cruder and grosser matter that bears a lesser degree of matter does so by its nature and cannot lose or gain a degree of motion. Similarly, the more quickly moving, finer parts of matter also bear their greater degree of motion by nature and cannot gain, lose or communicate the motion either. This view is related to another major theme of Cavendish’s work, one that we might call vitalism.

b. Vitalism and the Variability Argument

In addition to her commitment to materialism, Cavendish took pains to reject a position that was often associated with materialism in the seventeenth century, namely that of mechanism. Mechanism can be understood as the view that the natural world, as well as human beings, are made up of uniform material components that interact according to laws of motion and collision. One statement of this view, with which Cavendish was familiar, can be found in the opening chapters of Thomas Hobbes’ Leviathan. René Descartes, too, provided a mechanistic account of the natural world—apart from his commitment to the existence of the immaterial souls of human beings, of course.

Cavendish argued that mechanism could not be an accurate account of the natural world, because it could not properly explain the world that we observe. She claimed that two notable features of the natural world are variety and orderliness. The world around us is full of a vast array of different sorts of creatures and things, each performing distinctive activities or bearing distinct properties. Despite the natural world’s plentitude, it was also orderly. If we understand the nature of a particular creature or substance, we could predict successfully how it might behave or react to certain stimuli. Cavendish reasoned that if the world was ultimately constituted by uniform matter, passively receiving and transferring motion, according to mathematical laws of collision, then the universe should be either entirely homogenous or entirely chaotic. In other words, if passive, uniform matter communicating motion was really all we had to explain nature, we would not be able to account for its variety and orderliness—it would lack one or the other.

Instead, she claimed, different parts of the infinite material substance bear different degrees of motion by nature. They cannot directly transfer motion from one body to another, since motion is a property of the body that possesses it and not as something that can exist apart from its body. Thus individual bodies cannot give or receive their motions. Hence, the phenomena we observe are not to be explained by reference to uniform pieces of matter exchanging motion via collision. Rather, she explains, what we see is like a dance, in which each body moves according to its own, distinctive, internal principle, such that a pattern might be created by the dancers on the dance floor. She explicitly offers this dance metaphor in her first work of 1653 and again in 1655. For example, when she explains perception, she claims that the rational spirits flow in and out of the body through the eyes and touch upon the object being perceived, intermixing with the rational spirits found therein. The object, possessing its own distinctive spirits and motions, dances a pattern before the rational spirits, which flow back into the eyes.  These rational spirits then take up the dance themselves, flowing back into the brain and continuing the dance, which she takes to be sufficient for the mind’s perceiving the object in virtue of the mind’s containing the distinctive dance or pattern. In these early works, she further explains that the rational spirits copy these dances based on a “natural sympathy” among adjacent bodies, particularly between the rational spirits of the perceiver and object perceived. Note that, throughout this account of perception, motion is never transferred from one body to another. Instead, motions and “dances” are taken up from the internal activity of the rational spirits, that is, from the nature of the moving matter. The matter moves itself according to its own nature and initiates changes in its own motion via natural sympathy.

By the 1660s, though, she largely replaces the dance metaphor with the terms “imitation” and “figuring out”, the latter in the sense of tracing or copying a shape or distinctive pattern of motion. Even so, the account is largely the same. Her argument from the Observations could be reconstructed as follows:

  1. Bodies move in orderly and infinitely variable ways.
  2. Either they are moved by spirits or they are moved by bodies.
  3. But not spirits because that is mysterious, so bodies.
  4. If bodily motion issues from the body, then, it must issue from either inanimate matter (mechanism) or animate matter (vitalism).
  5. But not inanimate matter (mechanism), for the mechanistic account of bodily motion, (such as animals spirits and inanimate fine particles that transmit force), cannot account for the infinite variety and orderliness of the activity in nature.
  6. So the bodily cause of motion must be the body’s animate matter, which (it is alleged) has an ability to produce an infinite variety of orderly effects.

This is what might be called the argument from the variability and regularity of nature for self-moving matter. Premise 5 implies the argument that if the world was ultimately constituted by uniform matter, passively receiving and transferring motion, according to mathematical laws of collision, then the universe should be either entirely homogenous or entirely chaotic. In this argument for self-moving matter, many of the central themes of Cavendish’s natural philosophy are visible: her materialist rejection of incorporeal causes, her denial of mechanistic explanation and her resulting vitalism.

Another significant feature of her natural philosophy, and one that appears especially clearly when she critiques mechanism, is her refusal to take mathematical physics as an exemplar. Whereas Cartesian and Hobbesian natural philosophy could be described as attempts to understand nature with metaphors and modes of explanation taken from the new, mathematical physics, Cavendish instead draws from other sources, especially her personal experiences with country life and, less directly, the life sciences. When explaining natural phenomena, she often makes reference to the behaviors of animals and humans, as well as her awareness of botanical phenomena. She in fact reported in the 1650s that Gerald’s Herbal, a botanical reference book, was the only scientific work she had read. Perhaps because of this, she often explained the behaviors of an animal’s or plant’s rational spirits in terms of their macro-level behaviors, rather than in terms of atomic or corpuscular, mathematical explanation. By the 1660s, at least, we know that she had read and engaged the work of other vitalist and anti-mechanists, such as the alchemist Johannes Baptista Van Helmont. However, even before that time, her preference for biological metaphors over those of mathematical physics was evident.

Cavendish’s preference for biological modes of explanation can also be seen in her organicism. Not only does she deny atomism, but she also argues that the parts of bodies in part possess their distinctive motions and natures in virtue of the larger, organic systems, in which they are located. She says, “[f]or example: an eye, although it be composed of parts, and has a whole and perfect figure, yet it is but part of the head, and could not subsist without it” (Observations, Ch. 31). This is not an argument for organicism; instead, she means it as an analogy to illustrate her views on individuals more generally.

Despite the similarities of her vitalism to that of Van Helmont or perhaps Henry More, Cavendish also departs from them in her commitment to materialism. Indeed, she accounts for life in nature by claiming that “[a]ll motion is life,” even in her first work of 1653. Human beings are alive, she says, because they are material beings composed of matter with varying degrees of motion moving in a distinctive pattern. For Cavendish that is all that is needed for something to be alive. Note, though, that all things in nature, from humans and animals and plants down to minerals and artifacts, are the things they are, because they are composed of matter with distinctive patterns and degrees of motion. In this regard, she resembles Hobbes, even though she will ultimately reject his mechanistic view of matter, especially with her view that all matter is self-moving. We might therefore say that Cavendish’s natural philosophy is committed to pan-vitalism or animism, or even, as Cudworth would later say, hylozoism. But we must remember that her view departs from the Cambridge Platonists and Van Helmont in denying that the principles of life are to be explained by reference to incorporeal powers, entities or properties. All matter is to some extent alive and all of nature is infused with a principle of life, but this principle of life is simply motion.

Thus Cavendish provides a fairly deflationary account of life as motion and in this regard her natural philosophy may resemble Hobbes or Descartes. Despite this similarity, Cavendish again rejects their mechanism in her denial of determinism, even with regards to bodily interaction. Though she often appeals to the orderliness and regularity of nature in defending her theory of self-moving matter, she also recognizes the presence of disorder in nature, such as in disease. In fact, she explains illness or disease as the rebellion of a part of the body against the whole, explaining that some bits of matter have freely chosen alternative motions and thus disrupted the harmonious all. In short, Cavendish ascribes a libertarian freedom not only to human agents but even to the parts of matter themselves, explaining the behaviors of organisms with a social ‘body politic’ metaphor. We might say, then, that she draws from experiences of the biological and botanical world to explain her metaphysics, but she also incorporates a Hobbesian sense of the body politic into her metaphysics and in so doing reinforces her rejection of the mechanistic worldview.

However, Cavendish does not stop at explaining the principle of life by reference to degrees of motion in matter, because she also claims to explain mental representation and ultimately knowledge in this way. When a particular pattern of motion occurs in the brain, say, via perception, the person perceives the object; for the person to have an idea of the object is just for her brain to contain its distinctive motion. More generally, she takes the presence of such patterned motions in matter to mean that said matter has knowledge, at least in some sense. Yet she also argues that such motions can be found throughout all of nature, every body possessing its own distinctive motions. For these reasons, her vitalist materialism fits nicely with her panpsychism.

c. Panpsychism

In saying that all motion is life and that all things in nature are composed of matter with a degree of motion, Cavendish affirms that life permeates all of the natural world, including what we might call inanimate objects. For Cavendish, inanimate objects are alive, because they possess motion, though they might have a lesser degree of motion, and thus a lesser degree of life, than an animal or human being. Indeed, she also believes that knowledge is similarly diffused across all of nature to greater and lesser degrees. For these reasons, we might call Cavendish an incremental naturalist with regard to knowledge and life. That is, she takes distinctively human traits such as knowledge and life to be natural properties that are present to varying degrees throughout all of nature.

Throughout her work, Cavendish argues that whatever has motion has knowledge and that knowledge is innate or internally directed motion. In her Philosophical Fancies of 1653, she explains that

the touch of the heel, or any part of the body else, is the like motion, as the thought thereof in the head; the one is the motion of the sensitive spirits, the other in the rational spirits, as touch from the sensitive spirits, for thought is only a strong touch, and touch a weak thought. So sense is a weak knowledge, and knowledge a strong sense, made by the degrees of the spirits (Chapter 45).

In the next chapter she continues to argue that all matter exhibits regular motion, which occurs because all matter is infused with sensitive spirits; but to have sensitive spirits is to be able to sense; thus all matter senses things.

Now, in her earliest work, she offers at best a “who knows so why not” sort of argument that matter thinks, saying, “[i]f so, who knows, but vegetables and minerals may have some of those rational spirits, which is a mind or soul in them, as well as man?" and “if their [vegetables and minerals] knowledge be not the same knowledge, but different from the knowledge of animals, by reason of their different figures, made by other kind of motion on other tempered matter, yet it is knowledge” (Chapter 46).

Later, for example in her Observations, she argues that the regularity of nature can best—or perhaps only—be explained by admitting that all material bodies possess knowledge. She argues that matter and material beings exhibit regular motion and then argues that “there can be no regular motion without knowledge, sense, and reason” (Observations, 129). Furhtermore, she argues that each part of the body and each object in nature exhibits a distinctive activity. The brain thinks; the stomach digests; the loins produce offspring—and they do so in regular and consistent ways. Indeed, each of these organs or parts of the body are themselves also composite, made up of an infinite number of smaller bodies. What unites them, however, is their distinctive motions, producing their distinctive behaviors. And Cavendish takes each of these distinctive motions to be a kind of knowledge.

She argues that we ought to think of these distinctive motions as knowledge, because that is the best, or perhaps only, way to explain the regularity and stability of these composites. If these parts are to do these things, they must know what they do, especially given the regular and consistent ways in which they do them. Indeed, without matter knowing its own distinctive motions, she argues, perception would be impossible. She says, “[s]elf-knowledge is the ground, or fundamental cause of perception: for were there not self-knowledge, there could not be perception” (Observations, 155). In short, all material entities, which is to say all things in nature, possess knowledge. The view that all things in nature possess mind or mental properties is panpsychism, to which Cavendish is committed here.

Even so, she uses the concept of knowledge in an unusual way. When she ascribes knowledge to a rock, or to my liver for example, but she neither necessarily means that the rock or my liver have mental states like ours nor that they can perceive their environments in the same way we do. For Cavendish, the knowledge of a thing like a mirror is, indeed, conditioned by the sort of motions that constitute the mirror, the motions that make it the thing it is; as such, mirror-knowledge and mirror-perception are very different from their human analogues. Even so, the mirror’s perception and knowledge are in some ways analogous to human perception and knowledge; both involve the object’s patterning out its own matter in a way, which copies or resembles an external object. Despite this similarity between a mirror and a human, the human being is composed of matter capable of many different kinds of perception and knowledge, whereas the mirror has a very limited ability to pattern out or reflect its environment. And the human has sufficient amounts of rational spirits uniting its parts to be able to conduct rational inquiry, whereas the rational matter of a mirror is very limited indeed.

This might sound as though she is walking back her commitment to panpsychism, but in fact she is not. For these parts or degrees of matter that possess varying levels of awareness are in fact entirely intermixed together in all things. She says, “there is a double perception in all parts of nature, to wit, rational and sensitive.... I believe there is sense and reason, or sensitive and rational knowledge, not only in all creatures, but in every part of every particular creature” (Ch. 36). Thus the rock, though it possesses a great deal of duller matter, also possesses sensitive and even rational spirits within. So Cavendish says,

self-motion is the cause of all the various...actions of nature; these cannot be performed without perception: for all actions are knowing and perceptive; and, were there no perceptions, there could not possibly be any such actions: for, how should parts agree, either in generation, composition, or dissolution of composed figures, if they had no knowledge or perception of each other? (Ch. 37, 167).

In short, Cavendish’s natural philosophy is materialist, vitalist and panpsychist, as well as anti-atomist and anti-mechanist. Unlike many of her opponents who favor mathematical physics, she takes the living things—and the limited awareness of the life sciences—as a model for her natural philosophy, as evidenced in her organicism, as well as her particular use of metaphor. In other words, she agrees with Descartes and Hobbes against the occult explanations of the Scholastics, with More and Van Helmont against the reductive mechanism of Hobbes and Descartes and with Hobbes and Stoic materialism against the incorporeal principles of More and Van Helmont.

d. God

Cavendish’s views on God are puzzling. She regularly repeats that we cannot assert the existence of things that are not observable material objects in the natural world and she does so in a way that might suggest to the modern reader that she does not believe in the immortality of the soul or the existence of an immaterial God. This would likely be a mistake, however, as there are several passages where she instead explains that she does not include God in her speculations, because we cannot speak with any degree of confidence about God’s nature. Though God is mostly absent from her work in the 1650s, in the Observations she says, “there is an infinite difference between divine attributes, and natural properties; wherefore to similize [sic] our reason, will, understanding, faculties, passions and figures etc. to God, is too high a presumption, and in some manner a blasphemy” (“Further Observations”, Ch 10, 215) and “God is incomprehensible, and above nature: but inasmuch as can be known, to wit, his being [i.e., that he exists]; and that he all-powerful...eternal, infinite, omnipotent, incorporeal, individual, immovable being” (*Further Observations*, Ch 11, 216-17). This certainly suggests that she takes God to exist or, at least, that she takes questions of his existence and nature to lie largely outside of the realm of natural philosophy and instead, perhaps, to be a matter of faith alone.

Nevertheless, we might speculate on the details of her views. As mentioned above, her views on the existence of a supernatural soul seem to be in tension with her other metaphysical commitments.  Similarly, her views on the existence of an immaterial God seem similarly in tension. Interestingly, she attaches an erratum on the final page of her first work, Philosophical Fancies, apologizing to the reader for having omitted the appropriate pieties and references to God in her natural philosophical system. What is even stranger is that, when she would reprint and re-write that system in her 1656 Philosophical and Physical Opinions, she would again omit any references to God and instead include the same erratum a second time.

Even so, it is unlikely she thought of herself as an atheist. Perhaps, as some scholars have interpreted Thomas Hobbes, she simply believed that she had no business discussing the nature of God’s existence as that was not a matter of rational inquiry but mere faith. It should be noted, however, that her several discussions of fame suggest that she was not convinced that she would have an existence after her own death.

3. Political Philosophy

In addition to her substantial work on natural philosophy, Cavendish also wrote many other works in a variety of genres, from essays on social issues to poems and plays, even the fantastic utopian fiction The Blazing World. Unlike her work on natural philosophy, however, in which she sets out her views in relatively systematic ways and in philosophical treatises, her thoughts on social or political issues appear in works of fiction or in essays strongly conditioned by rhetorical devices. For example, in Orations of Divers Sorts, she speaks in a variety of voices, imagining several fictional interlocutors who present a number of positions on issues, without indicating the author’s own views. Similarly, in her fiction, she often has several characters advocate for philosophical positions, which complicates any attribution of that view we might make to the author herself. Indeed, in The Blazing World Margaret Cavendish, the Duchess of Newcastle, appears as a character, who advises the Empress of the Blazing World on how her society ought to be governed. In this case, we might feel fairly confident that the views espoused by the character of Cavendish accord with the author’s own, but such attributions should be made only tentatively. Despite the challenges presented by the genres, in which she chose to address these issues, we might still attribute certain general views to her. Among the recurring issues she addressed are aristocracy, gender and fame.

a. Religious Liberty

To see the difficulty in ascribing unambiguous views to Cavendish in these works, consider her thoughts on liberty and stability. In her 1666 fictional work The Blazing World, an Empress has allowed her subjects a degree of political liberty. Regardless of who their parents were, for example, they could now choose their own careers. Some who were born of cobblers could become scientists and others born of soldiers could become priests and so on. In the story, this newfound freedom results in a breakdown of social harmony; the old institutions, by which the society had harmoniously functioned, begin to fail, there is strife and faction, and anarchy and civil war loom. Into this situation arrives the character of Margaret Cavendish who advises the formation of a single state sponsored religion. She further instructs the Empress in architectural details, indicating that an imposing cathedral be built from a magical burning stone found in this fictional world. Made, again, by some magical device, to float above the city, with a voice issuing from the Church with booming decrees that the old ways be reinstated, with everyone being born into and retaining the stations. The character of Cavendish proposes that doing so will cow the factious citizens and make them agree, so that cobblers will beget cobblers, soldiers give rise to soldiers and so on. When the Empress executes this plan social harmony is restored. This suggests to the reader that the author Cavendish opposes the sort of political liberty (or, perhaps better, social mobility) that the Empress had allowed; the reader might also conclude that Cavendish supports the institution of a strong state Church.

Yet in her 1662 Orations of Divers Sorts, she states in one of her orations that, if the people have already adopted a variety of religious views, then the government should grant liberty of conscience—that is, freedom of religion—because doing so is the only way to maintain peace. Indeed she says explicitly there that the government should grant this liberty, because a failure to do so will result in anarchy. Then, in the next oration immediately after, she argues from a different perspective, claiming instead that liberty of conscience would lead to liberty in the state, which in turn would result in anarchy. Political liberty, she claims, undermines the rule of law, without which there can be no justice and thus there will be anarchy. Finally, she presents a third oration in defense of a middle view. There she argues that liberty of conscience is acceptable if it concerns only private devotions, but not if it disrupts the public. In other words, if their religious beliefs do neither violate any laws nor harm the public, then those beliefs are to be allowed. We might speculate that she intends this final, middle view to be taken as the author’s own, but it is not always clear, especially when, rather than presenting two views and concluding with a compromise, she instead presents six or seven different opinions, as she does on the question of whether women are equal to men. Even so, the reader may suspect that, in this case, the compromise view is closest to Cavendish’s own.

One feature that unites these varied discussions, however, is Cavendish’s fundamental commitment to the importance of political stability. In each of the above cases, she motivates her position by assuming that social and political stability must be preserved above all. All the orations, as well as the character of Cavendish in The Blazing World, seem to assume that political stability is the goal and that the sovereign ought to employ whatever means will be successful in securing it. Like Hobbes, then, Cavendish takes the primary function of the State to provide stability. This attitude recurs in her defenses of royalism and aristocracy.

b. Royalism and Aristocracy

Cavendish came from a family of royalists, served as a maid in waiting to Queen Henrietta Maria during her and Charles the Second’s exile from England at the hands of the republican revolutionaries of Cromwell and married one of Charles’s staunchest royalist supporters, William Cavendish, Duke of Newcastle. Her commitment to royalism and, more generally, to aristocracy, appears frequently in her writing. When she discusses how a country ought to be governed, she is unwavering in her view that states are best ruled by a King or Queen, who should come from the aristocracy.

One can draw an interesting analogy between her natural philosophy and her politics here. When discussing the distinction between health and illness in animals, Cavendish describes the organism as a body politic; the healthy body is one, in which each part of the body plays its role appropriately, whereas a diseased body is one, in which one or more parts are in rebellion, acting against their natures, to the detriment of the whole organism. Indeed, given her vitalism and panpsychism, she might describe disease in the human body and political unrest or rebellion in remarkably similar terms. In both cases, the whole body is composed of a variety of different parts, each with its own distinctive activity or motion. Each part knows its role, its place, in the body politic, yet each part is free to direct its motions in a way contrary to its natural activity. If a part chooses to do so, it will throw the orderly harmony of the whole out of balance. To expand upon this metaphysical account, we might say that, for Cavendish, people have certain stations—roles and places—in society from birth by nature and social harmony is achieved when the citizens conduct themselves according to their knowledge of their own distinctive activities. As long as the cobblers cobble, the soldiers defend, the judges judge and the rulers rule, social harmony will be maintained and each person can cultivate themselves accordingly.

Indeed, this seems to be one of the central features of Cavendish the character’s advice to the Empress in The Blazing World. Being a fantastical and quasi-science fictional story, The Blazing World features citizens of a variety of animal species, all sentient, capable of human language and so on. Originally, each species has their own distinctive roles, belonging to their own, species-specific guilds. It is to this world that Cavendish urges the Empress to return, one where the citizens are like different species, each with their own peculiar skills and roles received in virtue of what sorts of people their parents were. If the people of The Blazing World simply accepted the stations into which they were born, social harmony would be regained. It is difficult not to see this as a parable of the Restoration of Charles II and the English aristocracy; peace is restored to England by the return of the aristocracy. Moreover, in 1665, the year before The Blazing World was published, her family was restored their lands and her husband was advanced to Dukedom for his service to the King during the Civil Wars.

c. Gender

Cavendish is also described at times as an early feminist. To be sure, her own remarkable life as an author and philosopher leads many to take her as an exemplar; one might say she was a feminist in deed, if not always in word.

Beyond that, though, some scholars argue that her writings are feminist as well. For many of the reasons cited above, such claims can be complicated. Consider the seven orations on women in her Orations of Divers Sorts. There she presents seven speeches that take up a variety of positions. She begins by lamenting the fact that men possess all the power and women entirely lack it. In a subsequent oration, she speculates that women lack power in society, due to natural inferiority. She then counters in the next oration that women might be able to achieve as much as men were they given the opportunity to engage in traditionally masculine activities. But the next speaker claims that, were women to imitate men in this way, they would become “hermaphroditical.” Instead, this orator suggests, women should cultivate feminine virtues such as chastity and humility. In the very next oration, however, the orator suggests that feminine virtues are inferior to masculine, so women should pursue masculine virtues instead. She concludes the series of orations on this topic with a new position, arguing that women are in fact superior to men because women, through their beauty, can control men.

What is the reader to make of this series of orations? It seems likely that Cavendish affirms the following empirical facts about her society: women lack power; women could gain fame and even perhaps power if they pursued masculine virtues; they might even be equally capable as men in cultivating these virtues; yet women would be despised if they did pursue these virtues; if women cultivated feminine virtues, they would not be despised and could even acquire a kind of indirect power, but such a state of affairs is ultimately inferior to the power men possess. What is less clear is whether Cavendish really believes that the pursuit of so-called masculine virtues would somehow harm women by causing them to deny their natures. In other words, it is not clear from these orations whether Cavendish thinks women are naturally inferior to men. In her earlier Worlds Olio, on the other hand, she seems less ambivalent, claiming that women are in general inferior to men at rhetoric. Some women may cultivate skill in rhetoric to rival and even exceed that of men, but they are few, she claims, in this work.

Some readers might point to The Blazing World, and to the power of the Empress or the success of the character of Cavendish as a political adviser. It is true that the Empress leads her people in a successful naval battle, defeating a mortal enemy of her homeland. A similar event occurs in her story Bell in Campo. Even so, the considerations above suggest that social harmony is restored because she returns to aristocratic values. After all, the notion that a woman might lead an empire, even into war, would not be so foreign to an English subject in the 1660s, given that Queen Elizabeth ruled just a few decades before and had overseen the important naval defeat of the Spanish Armada.

From her first work and throughout her career, Cavendish engaged the issue of women in her writing, reflecting on her own experience as a woman and how, or whether, it shaped her writing or philosophy. Thus, with her impressive life and regular consideration of the relevance of gender to her thought, Cavendish can be seen as an important precursor for later more explicitly feminist writers, even if she herself might not be aptly so described.

4. References and Further Reading

(Formater: Insert paragraphs for this section here.)

a. Cavendish’s Works in the 17th Century

Only the first publication is listed for each work; Cavendish revised and reprinted several of her works multiple times over the years. So, for example, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy first appeared in 1666 but reappeared, with the addition of The Blazing World, in 1668. And Grounds of Natural Philosophy is a substantially revised version of her earlier Philosophical and Physical Opinions, itself, which contained her early Philosophical Fancies as its first part.

  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical Fancies, London: printed by Thomas Roycroft for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1653.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, The World's Olio, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1655.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical and Physical Opinions, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1655.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Nature’s Pictures, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1656.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Plays, London: printed for J. Martin, J. Allestrye and T. Dicas, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Orations of Divers Sorts, Accommodated to Divers Places, London: printed by W. Wilson, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, ‘Bell in Campo’, in Playes, London: J. Martin, J. Allestrye and T. Dicas, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Sociable Letters, London: printed by William Wilson, 1664.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical Letters, London: possibly printed by David Maxwell, 1664.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy, London: printed by Anne Maxwell, 1666.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1666.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Life of William, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1667.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Grounds of Natural Philosophy, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1668.

b. Modern Editions of Her Works

  • Cavendish, Margaret, The Description Of A New World, Called The Blazing World And Other Writings, ed, Kate Lilley. London: William Pickering, 1992.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Paper Bodies: A Margaret Cavendish Reader, eds. Sylvia Bowerbank and Sara Mendelson. Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press, 2000.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Observations upon Experimental Philosophy, ed. Eileen O'Neill. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Margaret Cavendish: Political Writings, ed. Susan James. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.

c. Secondary Literature

  • Battigelli, Anna, 1998, Margaret Cavendish and The Exiles of the Mind, Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s life and works from a scholar of English literature, with discussions on genre and rhetorical devices in her works.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2006,“Fame, Virtue, and Government: Margaret Cavendish on Ethics and Politics,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 67: 251–289.
    • One of the few discussions of Cavendish’s ethics, with a productive focus on fame.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2013, “Margaret Cavendish on Gender, Nature, and Freedom,” Hypatia 28 (3): 516-532.
    •  An excellent account of the complexities of Cavendish on gender.
  • Broad, Jacqueline, 2002, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • This text contains a chapter on Cavendish.
  • Clucas, Stephen, 1994, “The Atomism of the Cavendish Circle: A Reappraisal,” The Seventeenth Century, 9: 247–273.
    • Clucas argues that Cavendish never really gave up atomism.
  • Cunning, David, 2006, “Cavendish on the Intelligibility of the Prospect of Thinking Matter,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 23: 117–136.
    • A discussion of Cavendish and the notion of thinking matter, with connections to contemporary philosophy of mind.
  • Cunning, David, 2010, “Margaret Lucas Cavendish,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2006, “Atomism, Monism, and Causation in the Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish,” in Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler (eds.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 3: 199–240
    • A long and thorough exploration of some themes in Cavendish’s metaphysics. She refutes Clucas on atomism and provides an insightful analysis on causation.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2007, “Reason and Freedom: Margaret Cavendish on the Order and Disorder of Nature,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 89: 157–191.
    • Detlefsen notes that matter itself must be free of necessity, in order to explain the disorder in nature that Cavendish allows for, especially in disease, in part via a ‘body politic’ analogy.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2009, “Margaret Cavendish on the Relationship Between God and World,” Philosophy Compass, 4: 421–438.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s views on God.
  • Duncan, Stewart, 2013, “Cavendish and the Divine, Supernatural, Immaterial Soul,” The Mod Squad: A Group Blog in Modern Philosophy, Accessed November 4, 2014.
    • A discussion and consideration of the nature and role of the supernatural soul in Cavendish’s metaphysics.
  • Duncan, Stewart, 2012, “Debating Materialism: Cavendish, Hobbes, and More,” History of Philosophy Quarterly 29 (4): 391-409.
    • An analysis of Cavendish that clarifies and contextualizes her materialism vis-à-vis Hobbes and More, with whom her thought shares some important similarities.
  • Hutton, Sarah, 1997, “In Dialogue with Thomas Hobbes: Margaret Cavendish's natural philosophy,” Women's Writing, 4: 421–432.
    • Cavendish’s debt, and response, to Hobbes’s metaphysics.
  • James, Susan, 1999, “The Philosophical Innovations of Margaret Cavendish,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 7: 219–244.
    • An excellent overview of the major themes in Cavendish’s metaphysics.
  • James, Susan, 2003, “Introduction,” in Margaret Cavendish: Political Writings, ed. Susan James, Cambridge: Cambridge UP (2003).
    • An overview of Cavendish’s social and political themes.
  • Kroetsch, Cameron, 2013, “List of Margaret Cavendish’s Texts, Printers, and Booksellers,” The Digital Cavendish Project, Accessed November 4, 2014.
    • A detailed account of the printing and publishing of Cavendish’s works.
  • Lascano, Marcy. “An Introduction to Margaret Cavendish, or ‘Why You Should Include Margaret Cavendish in Your Early Modern Course and Buy the Book.’” The Mod Squad, A Group Blog in Early Modern Philosophy. Accessed July 14, 2014.
    •  Lascano makes a compelling case for the inclusion of Cavendish in Early Modern Philosophy survey courses.
  • Lewis, Eric, 2001, “The Legacy of Margaret Cavendish,” Perspective on Science, 9: 341–365.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s reception, both among her contemporaries and ours. Valuable in part for its identification of lacunae in recent scholarship.
  • Michaelian, Kourken, 2009, “Margaret Cavendish's Epistemology,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 17: 31–53.
    • The only extended discussion of Cavendish’s epistemology, with a special focus on her distinction of internal and external knowledge.
  • O'Neill, Eileen, 1998, “Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and Their Fate in History,” in Janet A. Kourany (ed.), Philosophy in a Feminist Voice, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • The locus classicus for discussion of the way in which women philosophers were written out of histories in the past two centuries.
  • O'Neill, Eileen, 2001, “Introduction,” in Margaret Cavendish, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy, Eileen O'Neill (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, x-xxxvi.
    • An excellent account of Cavendish’s mature thought, in what is arguably her greatest work.
  • Sarasohn, Lisa, 2010, The Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish: Reason and Fancy During the Scientific Revolution, Baltimore, MA: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
    • An examination of Cavendish’s natural philosophy by an historian of science.
  • Whitaker, Katie, 2002, Mad Madge: The Extraordinary Life of Margaret CavendishDuchess of Newcastle, the First Woman to Live by Her Pen, New York: Basic Books.
    • An entertaining biography of Cavendish.

Author Information

Eugene Marshall
Florida International University
U. S. A.

Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716)

LeibnizWidely hailed as a universal genius, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz was one of the most important thinkers of the late 17th and early 18th centuries. A polymath and one of the founders of calculus, Leibniz is best known philosophically for his metaphysical idealism; his theory that reality is composed of spiritual, non-interacting “monads,” and his oft-ridiculed thesis that we live in the best of all possible worlds. Though these ideas may make his philosophy seem exceedingly abstract, Leibniz had keen interest in less abstract fields, such as empirical physics and jurisprudence. He also made great contributions to logic, with some considering him the greatest logician since Aristotle.

Due to his belief in a rationally ordered universe, his commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, and his acceptance of innate ideas, Leibniz is rightly ranked along with Descartes and Spinoza as one of the seminal early modern rationalists. Leibniz stands out in this tradition, however, for his novel efforts to find compatibility between classical and modern thought. He retained ancient and scholastic notions such as substantial form and final cause, while at the same time attempting to improve upon the mechanical philosophies of Hobbes, Spinoza, and Descartes. He also hoped his comprehensive philosophical system would serve as a common ground for uniting the determinedly divided Christian denominations in Europe. Such irenic pursuits make Leibniz a unique transitional figure in the history of philosophy. He has been called both the last in the lineage of great Christian Platonists and the first thinker to tackle the intellectual problems of modern Europe. After an introduction to his life and works, this article will examine the key elements of Leibniz’s ambitious philosophical program.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Writings
  2. Key Principles
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Substantial Forms
    2. Substance as Complete Concept
    3. Causality and Pre-Established Harmony
    4. Idealism
    5. The Nature of Body
    6. Efficient and Final Causality
  4. Theodicy
    1. Leibniz’s Project
    2. God
    3. Possible Worlds and Optimism
    4. Freedom and Necessity
  5. Epistemology
    1. Ideas and Knowledge
    2. Innate Ideas
    3. Petites Perceptions
    4. Reflection, Memory, Selfhood
  6. Ethics
    1. Intellect and Will
    2. Justice and Charity
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources: Leibniz Texts and Translations
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Introductory Texts
      2. More Advanced Studies
      3. Collected Essays

1. Life and Writings

Leibniz was born on 1 July 1646, during the waning years of the Thirty Years’ War, in the Lutheran town of Leipzig. His father, Friedrich, was professor of moral philosophy at the University in Leipzig. His mother, Catherina Schmuck, was the daughter of a law professor. Leibniz grew up in an educated, and by all accounts, orthodox Lutheran environment. Between the books of his father, those of his maternal grandfather, and the contributions of Friedrich’s bookselling former father-in-law, Leibniz had access to an impressive library. At a young age, he gained a love for classical literature and the writings of the Church Fathers.

From 1661-63, Leibniz pursued university studies in Leipzig, with a brief stay at the university in Jena in 1663. At the time, the curriculum at these universities was still largely scholastic with some pedagogical practices bearing traces of the Ramist encyclopedic tradition. Leibniz’s main teachers, Jakob Thomasius in Leipzig and Erhard Weigel in Jena, were Aristotelians with eclectic interests. Leibniz had his own eclectic interests, having gained some, mostly second-hand, familiarity with modern mechanical philosophy. Later in his life, he recounted a fateful stroll through the Rosental in Leipzig in which he debated the respective merits of scholastic and modern thinking. “Mechanism finally prevailed,” he recalled, “and led me to apply myself to mathematics” (G III, 606). Though steeped in classical and scholastic learning, Leibniz at quite a young age fashioned himself a man of the times.

Leibniz went on to pursue a degree in law, earning his doctorate from the University in Altdorf in 1666. His writings from his student years include his bachelor’s dissertation, A Metaphysical Disputation on the Principle of Individuation, an early work in combinatorial logic titled A Dissertation on the Art of Combinations, and works on legal theory.

After short stints in Nuremburg and Frankfurt, Leibniz took his first major employment in the Catholic court of the Prince-Archbishop of Mainz, Johann Philipp von Schӧnborn in 1668. Leibniz was tasked with reforming legal codes and statutes. During his time in Mainz, Leibniz struck up an important relationship with Baron Johann Christian von Boineburg, the central statesman in the Mainz court. Boineburg appreciated Leibniz’s considerable talents and set before him the task of solving the day’s most pressing philosophical and theological questions. Through his association with Boineburg, Leibniz began to see the challenges modern philosophy, especially the materialism of Gassendi and Hobbes, posed to belief in the immortality of the soul, to belief in God and natural law, and to both Catholic and Lutheran understandings of the Eucharist. Leibniz thus from 1668-70 began working on a number of preliminary studies meant to be part of a comprehensive work entitled Catholic Demonstrations. Though this dreamed-of magnum opus never materialized, Leibniz never abandoned his goal of developing a modern philosophy congenial to Christian theology. In addition to his Catholic Demonstrations writings, Leibniz’s Elements of Natural Law, written between 1669 and 1671, also contributed to these efforts. Furthermore, during this period Leibniz intensified his interest in physics, writing the Theory of Abstract Motion and the New Physical Hypothesis, and penning an unanswered letter to Thomas Hobbes on the Englishman’s physical theory as it relates to the philosophy of mind. Leibniz in hindsight found these youthful physical works unimpressive, but they attest to the diversity of his interests.

Mainz opened Leibniz to an extraordinarily broad range of philosophical concerns; his most intense period of intellectual development soon followed. In 1672, Leibniz was dispatched to Paris on a diplomatic mission as well as on personal business for Boineburg. Paris exposed Leibniz to learning, resources, and interlocutors the likes of which he had never seen. He had access to the unpublished writings of Descartes and Pascal. He met with leading Parisian intellectuals Antoine Arnauld and Nicholas Malebranche. He studied mathematics under the Dutch mathematician Christiaan Huygens. He twice visited London, in 1673 and 1676, meeting with the mathematicians and physicists of the Royal Society. Leibniz’s friend Walther von Tschirnhaus, though forbidden from showing Leibniz an advanced copy, apprised Leibniz of many of the contents of Spinoza’s Ethics. This led Leibniz, upon leaving Paris in 1676, to make an excursion to The Hague to visit Spinoza.

Paris and London offered Leibniz the opportunity to establish himself as a rising star in the European intellectual orbit and Leibniz did not squander his chance. By 1675 he had developed the infinitesimal calculus, only three years after he started the serious study of contemporary mathematics. He also continued to write on a wide range of philosophical topics. His Confession of a Philosopher of 1672-3 was his first response to the problem of evil and to the question of determinism. His most important collection of metaphysical papers from the period, De summa rerum, contains some of Leibniz’s early responses to Spinoza’s monism, with budding reflections on the relationship between mind and body, on the nature of the continuum, and on universal harmony.

In 1676, Leibniz accepted a position in the court of Duke Johann Friedrich of Hanover, employed mainly to serve as court librarian and to consult on engineering projects in the Harz mines. After his taste of the intellectual scenes in Paris and London, Leibniz found life in Hanover a disappointment. Despite his lack of professional prospects, Leibniz would in the ensuing decade sharpen his intellectual vision. He published a number of important essays on mathematics, epistemology, and physics in the new journal Acta Eruditorum. In 1686, while it snowed in the Harz, Leibniz composed “a little discourse on metaphysics.” Now published without the diminutive “little,” the Discourse on Metaphysics is widely considered Leibniz’s first mature philosophical statement. Leibniz sent a summary of the Discourse to Arnauld, sparking an extended and illuminating correspondence between them on issues of freedom, causality, and occasionalism.

In 1689, Leibniz travelled to Italy on official business, researching possible ancestral ties to the Guelf Dukes of Hanover. Leibniz, never one to let official duties interfere with his own intellectual agenda, used the opportunity to pitch his metaphysics to leading Catholic intellectuals. He also wrote works on cosmology in efforts to exonerate the Copernican system from Vatican censure.

Leibniz returned in 1690 to Hanover, which remained his home base until his death. Leibniz continued to write prodigiously and we can mention here only a small sample of his works. 1695 saw the publication of the first part of his Specimen of Dynamics and his New System of Nature. The former work included Leibniz’s reflections on the nature of force, and in many ways was developed in response to Newton’s Principia Mathematica; the latter was Leibniz’s first public presentation of his theory of pre-established harmony. In 1703, Leibniz began work on The New Essays on Human Understanding, a book-length dialogue in response to Locke’s Essay on Human Understanding. The only book Leibniz published during his lifetime, the Theodicy, was released in 1710. In this work, Leibniz defends his thesis that we live in best of all possible worlds and defends the reasonableness of Christianity against the fideism and skepticism of Pierre Bayle. In 1714, Leibniz wrote the Monadology, the last comprehensive summary statement of his philosophical views.

Throughout his years in Hanover, Leibniz maintained a stunning number of epistolary correspondents. Notable among these were Samuel Clark, Burchard de Volder, Johann Bernoulli, Bartholomew Des Bosses, and Christian Wolff. Leibniz also corresponded and often met with Sophie, Electress of Hanover, and her daughter Sophie Charlotte, Queen of Prussia. These women encouraged, and in many ways made possible, Leibniz’s philosophical pursuits while employed at the court.

Leibniz’s final years were clouded by charges that he stole ideas from the papers of Isaac Newton when developing the calculus in the 1670s. Leibniz has been cleared of the charges and it is now accepted that the two men developed the calculus independently. Leibniz died on 14 November 1716 after struggles with gout and arthritis.

Unlike the other major philosophical lights of his era, and despite having written more than any of them, Leibniz produced no magnum opus. He seemed most at home in dialogue, in correspondence, and in controversy. The Discourse on Metaphysics and Monadology are his most commonly studied works in metaphysics. Scholars disagree about the extent to which the two works are in accord, but they together provide a solid grounding in Leibniz’s thought. The Theodicy is a classic of philosophical theology and the New Essays provides the fullest account of Leibniz’s epistemology. This article will summarize Leibniz’s philosophy mainly as it is presented in these works. It would be a mistake, however, to think that one can get a full picture of Leibniz’s interests from these works and the reader is encouraged to consult the many excellent edited selections of Leibniz’s texts.

2. Key Principles

Several key principles form the core of Leibniz’s philosophy. Though Leibniz never lists these serially in the manner of, for instance, the axioms of Spinoza’s Ethics, the principles nonetheless shape Leibniz’s thinking and ground his major claims. He refers to them throughout his writings and we shall refer to them throughout our discussion. Though each of these principles merits further analysis in its own right, we introduce them only briefly here. Truly unique to Leibniz is not so much these principles in themselves as the use to which he collectively puts them.

In the Monadology, Leibniz writes that we reason “based on two great principles” (M 30). The first of these is the principle of contradiction, which deems every contradiction to be false. Classically stated, the principle of contradiction holds that something cannot be both “x” and “not x” at the same time and in the same respect. Aristotle claimed that all logic and reasoning presupposes the principle of contradiction and Leibniz sees no reason to think otherwise.

The second great principle of reason is the principle of sufficient reason, “by virtue of which we consider that we can find no true or existent fact, no true assertion, without there being a sufficient reason why it is thus and not otherwise, although most of these reasons cannot be known to us” (M 31). The classical statement of the principle of sufficient reason is nihil sine ratione: there is nothing without reason or cause. Leibniz holds that every state of affairs has an explanation, even if we must admit that we often do not have sufficient information to provide an explanation. The principle of sufficient reason assumes great prominence in Leibniz’s philosophy, most notably in his accounts of substance, causality, freedom, and optimism.

Closely related to the principle of sufficient reason is the principle of the best. This principle holds that rational beings always choose, and act for, the best. In this way, reason is teleologically ordered towards goodness. On Leibniz’s thinking, if reason did not opt for what is best, it would act arbitrarily; it would not have a sufficient reason for choosing one option over another, thus violating reason’s second great principle. Goodness provides the sufficient reason for rational choice. The principle of the best manifests itself differently in the cases of God and created minds. God, whom Leibniz considers “an absolutely perfect being” (DM 1), and who thus knows what is best, always acts in the best way. Created minds, who have a finite degree of perfection and thus limited knowledge of what is best, always act according to what seems the best from their limited perspectives.

The predicate-in-notion principle provides Leibniz’s notion of truth: praedicatum inest subjecto. In any true, affirmative proposition the predicate is contained in the subject. In order for the proposition, “Leibniz is a mathematician,” to be true, the idea “mathematician” must somehow be included in the idea “Leibniz.” Leibniz’s interpretation of the predicate-in-notion principle, we shall see, has far-reaching consequences for his metaphysics. Somewhat relatedly, Leibniz affirms the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, which states that any two objects sharing all properties are in fact the same, identical object. Each individual object contains some individuating characteristic. Important for Leibniz, this individuating characteristic must be something intrinsic to the individual, and not simply a separation in space and time, which Leibniz considers purely extrinsic denominations. The principle of the identity of indiscernibles is tied closely to the predicate-in-notion principle insofar as the latter makes intrinsic properties the basis of all truth and the former makes such properties the basis for identity and individuation.

A final key principle worth noting is the principle of continuity. “Nothing takes place suddenly, and it is one of my great principles that nature never makes leaps,” Leibniz writes in the New Essays. “I call this the Law of continuity” (NE 56). All change is continuous; there is never a leap, but rather a series of intervening stages. This principle is especially germane to Leibniz’s development of the infinitesimal calculus, but relevant too to his metaphysics and epistemology.

3. Metaphysics

a. Substantial Forms

One of the earliest intellectual projects Leibniz set for himself was to determine the proper relationship between the Aristotelian philosophy taught at his university in Leipzig and the new, mechanical philosophy espoused by thinkers like Galileo, Descartes, and Hobbes. Leibniz embraces modern, mechanical physics as the proper method for investigating nature, yet he is distinctive among 17th century thinkers for the depths of his efforts to retain several key metaphysical concepts of ancient and medieval philosophy. Chief among these concepts is the Aristotelian idea of substantial form. Though Leibniz does not adopt the traditional understanding of substantial form in its details, his grappling with the legitimacy of this notion sets the trajectory for much of his metaphysics.

Aristotle, with the medieval scholastics following him, argues that any individual thing consists of a substantial form, which determines the kind of thing it is, and matter, which individuates the thing and makes it numerically distinct from other like substances. So, a particular squirrel consists of the universal form “squirrel” shaping and directing particular material stuff. In the 17th century, the idea that substantial forms should enter into physical accounts of nature becomes especially odious. Citing “squirrelness,” the moderns maintain, tells us nothing regarding the activity of a squirrel. For thinkers such as Hobbes and Descartes, substantial forms are useless fictions, at best superfluous and at worst misleading. The mathematically-based, mechanical laws governing matter in motion suffice to explain the whole of nature, with no need to take into account the kind of thing under investigation. What counts in describing the behavior of a squirrel is not its “squirrelness,” but the forces its limbs exert on one another, the pressure differentials in its circulatory system, and other quantifiable data. This approach makes it possible to have a single method for investigating all natural phenomena.

Leibniz agrees that substantial forms have no use in physics, but he insists metaphysical accounts of reality require something like substantial forms. Mechanical explanation adequately addresses the activity of the physical world, but not its underlying nature. For Leibniz, the corporeal world its very essence depends on incorporeal principles. Both Hobbes’ purely materialist metaphysics and the strict substance-dualism of Descartes fail to properly appreciate nature’s dependence on purely metaphysical entities. Ultimately, Leibniz’s defense of substantial forms provides the first step in the development of his idealist metaphysics.

Leibniz offers several defenses of substantial forms, in which he tries not to revive Aristotle’s notion of form wholesale, so much as to prove the existence of irreducible, incorporeal entities. One argument turns on the principle of sufficient reason: the fact that the corporeal world itself cannot offer any explanation for its particular features. Why does a given body occupy so much space, have a particular shape, or move in just this way? By limiting oneself to mechanical explanation, one can either say that body A’s features were caused by body B, or one can say that body A has had its particular constitution from eternity. The former approach leads to an infinite regress in explanation, which is to say it never arrives at an explanation at all. There is always yet another body requiring explanation. The latter approach, for Leibniz, likewise offers no real explanation. Citing eternity as a reason, he feels, amounts to answering the question “Why is A, x?” with “Simply because A is x and always has been x,” dodging the question. Since the corporeal world does not contain sufficient explanation for its own features, Leibniz concludes that the cause of such features lies in incorporeal principles.

In a second defense of incorporeal substantial principles, Leibniz denies the Cartesian distinction between the primary qualities of bodies and secondary qualities such as color and temperature (DM 12). Descartes, anticipating Locke, argues that the secondary qualities of bodies are relative to the perceiving subject. For instance, as we observe in cases of color-blindness, one person perceives an object as red and another person the same object as green. Color, the argument goes, is thus not a property of the body itself, but depends on the interaction between object and perceiver. Descartes holds, however, that size, shape, and motion are not relative properties, but constitute the essence of body itself. Leibniz, believing that space and time are relative, counters that these primary properties which depend on space and time, and also include something relative to perception. No perceived material quality, therefore, accounts for what a body essentially is. It follows that incorporeal principles must be the real metaphysical building blocks of reality.

A third argument for substantial forms comes in Leibniz’s treatment of force. Descartes had confused force with what we would call momentum. He measured force by multiplying mass by velocity, not by acceleration, or the square of velocity. For Leibniz, this error on the part of Descartes points to an important fact about reality. Motion, measured by mv, is relative. When several objects change positions, one cannot with certainty attribute motion to one object or another. Force, however, has more reality. We have sufficient reason to attribute it to one body over others. In other words, we have more certainty which body in a system is the proximate cause of changes in other bodies. Force, therefore, has more reality than motion, and yet force is not corporeal in the way both mass and velocity are since force is not extended. Though Descartes’ confusion seems simply an error in calculation, in it Leibniz sees additional indication that the realities grounding corporeal objects are not themselves corporeal.

b. Substance as Complete Concept

Though his defense of incorporeal substances allows Leibniz to partially reconcile pre-modern and modern thought, Leibniz still needs to articulate his own account of the nature of these substances. In §8 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz takes up the task of defining individual substance. He begins with Aristotle’s definition, which states that when many things are said of a subject, yet it is said of nothing else, this subject is rightly called an individual substance. So, for instance, we say of Alexander the Great that he is Macedonian and ambitious, but we do not say of anything else that it is Alexander the Great. Thus, Alexander is an individual substance.

Leibniz deems this Aristotelian definition of substance merely logical. It tells us something about the structure of thought and language, but does not provide a metaphysical account of substance. To move to a proper metaphysical understanding, Leibniz believes we must look more closely at the nature of predication. “All true predication,” he writes, “has some basis in the nature of things.” Here, Leibniz shows his belief that there is isomorphism between metaphysics and logic. All true propositions have an ontological basis. All we can truly say of Alexander the Great is included in Alexander’s nature.

The idea that each substance includes all the predicates which belong to it is, Leibniz takes it, simply a metaphysical restatement of the predicate-in-notion principle. On the basis of this principle, Leibniz arrives at his notion of substance as a complete concept:

The nature of an individual substance or of a complete being is to have a notion so complete that it is sufficient to contain and to allow us to deduce from it all the predicates of the subject to which the notion is attributed. (DM 8)

Leibniz’s thought is essentially this: if one had a sufficiently powerful intellect, one could deduce from the idea of any individual substance all that could ever be said of it, in just the same way that if one has a clear and distinct idea of a circle, one can deduce all the properties of a circle. From the very concept of Alexander the Great, the infinite intellect of God can deduce all Alexander’s qualities, including that he is the vanquisher of Darius. To be a substance, then, is to have such a corresponding complete concept. Every substance, as it were, includes its biography.

Beginning in the 1690s, “monad” becomes Leibniz’s preferred term for a complete, incorporeal, individual substance. The term monad derives from the Greek mónos, meaning alone or solitary. Leibniz introduces the term to underscore the fact that individual substances are not only complete, but also simple. As Leibniz’s defense of substantial forms showed, the material realm needs grounding in something incorporeal. Matter, however, can be infinitely divided. Leibniz therefore reasons that there must be infinite simple monads populating the world at even the most infinitesimal levels. Leibniz likens the fullness and complexity of the monadic universe to “nested” ponds and gardens.

Each portion of matter can be conceived as a garden full of plants, and as a pond full of fish. But each branch of a plant, each limb of an animal, each drop of its humors, is still another such garden or pond. (M 67)

Monads are thus “spiritual atoms,” the incorporeal building blocks of all reality. They are the complete entities which merit the designation “substance.”

It is in the nature of each monad to have its own internal principle of activity. As Leibniz writes, “activity is of the essence of substance in general” (NE 65). Beginning in the 1690s, Leibniz refers to the internal activity of substances as their primitive active forces. Defining substance in terms of activity is important to Leibniz for several reasons. For one, this position is of a piece with his contention that the activity of corporeal entities is grounded in that of incorporeal entities. In order to play this role, incorporeal monads must themselves be active. More importantly, Leibniz broaches the discussion of substance in the Discourse on Metaphysics with the goal of differentiating the actions of God from those of creatures. In arguing that each substance has its own primitive active force, Leibniz distances himself both from Spinoza’s monism and Malebranche’s occasionalism, the former holding that individual things are not themselves substances but rather modes of a single divine substance, and the latter invoking God’s power to explain the ordinary doings of creatures. To Leibniz, each of these positions insufficiently appreciates that each substance is complete and active in itself. For, were created substances to lack activity, there would be no distinction between actual, created substances and the possible yet uncreated substances in God’s mind, a modal distinction central to Leibniz’s theodicy.

c. Causality and Pre-Established Harmony

If each substance is complete in itself and requires no other substance to be understood, it follows that every finite substance is causally independent of all save God. Each created substance is, as Leibniz says, “like a world apart” (DM 14). But how can this be? How can Alexander defeat Darius without being related to, and thus in a sense dependent on, Darius? More broadly, how can Leibniz square his “world apart” language with our experience of living in a world with a plethora of cause and effect relationships between substances?

Leibniz responds to these questions by offering a unique theory of causal interaction, which he calls at different points either the theory of pre-established harmony or the hypothesis of concomitance. The theory holds that although no two substances directly influence each other, they can express each other, that is, the activity of one can be reflected in the concept of the other. Alexander, we typically say, caused Darius’ death. Leibniz does not object to this kind of causal attribution, but insists that at the metaphysical level, what we call causality amounts to no more than this: it is in the nature of Alexander to be he who defeats Darius and it is likewise in the nature of Darius to be him defeated by Alexander. These two independent substances, as Leibniz puts it, “mirror” each other, so that at the exact moment it can be predicated of Alexander that he is the vanquisher of Darius, it can likewise be predicated of Darius that he is the victim of Alexander.

Hence, although each substance is “like a world apart,” substances form a common world by mirroring, or expressing, one another. God ordains at the moment of creation—in Leibniz’s terms he “preestablishes”—that the perceptions of all creatures in the world harmonize with one another, that there is strict alignment so that at the moment I perceive myself as tapping my friend on the shoulder, she perceives herself as being tapped. Leibniz is fond of likening the relationship between substances to that between two perfectly synchronized clocks which remain aligned despite never touching each other. Causal interaction is no more than what we find in these clocks, the harmonized activity of independent entities. Leibniz famously describes independent monads as “windowless,” neither letting in any outside influence nor issuing any influence (M 7). This is the Leibnizian universe: windowless monads in pre-established harmony.

The theory of pre-established harmony includes the rather strong claim that each substance is harmonized with all other substances in the world. This must be the case if the substances are to form a common world with a common history, since mutual expression is the only possible relation between independent substances. Does this mean that my concept expresses the nature of even a fish living thousands of years ago? In a word, yes. Though Alexander and Darius express each other much more distinctly than I express the ancient fish, my concept must bear traces of the existence of that fish since we are members of a common world. This might seem fantastical, even absurd, but if one considers how much one’s own experience reflects the activities and efforts of one’s predecessors, and how much their activities were constrained by their natural environment, then perhaps one can begin to appreciate Leibniz’s insight that every single substance bears traces of, or faintly expresses, the whole universe, past, present, and future.

Leibniz’s explanation of causality via pre-established harmony and mutual expression has led some commentators to accuse Leibniz of what they call the “mirroring problem.” They object that if substance A expresses the essence of all others, yet these in turn express substance A, then the world is like a hall of mirrors which reflect one another but no concrete images. In this scenario, the concept of any given substance is not complete, as Leibniz would hold, but empty. Although this line of objection points to some of the complexities and potential difficulties in the theory of pre-established harmony, it merits mention that Leibniz sees each substance as fundamentally mirroring God. “It can even be said that every substance bears in some way the character of God’s infinite wisdom and omnipotence and imitates him as much as it is capable” (DM 9). Stating that each substance reflects God’s essence, while also mirroring all other substances, does not directly respond to the mirroring problem. Noting that each substance reflects God’s essence by virtue of its own internal individuating activity perhaps provides a more satisfying response, and it is likely that Leibniz’s solution to the mirroring problem lies in this direction.

d. Idealism                                                                      

Leibniz’s defense of incorporeal monads as the foundation of the physical world, his notion of substance as a complete concept, and his account of causality via pre-established harmony all contribute to Leibniz’s brand of idealism. By idealism, we mean the thesis that nothing exists in the world but minds and their ideas. As Leibniz summarizes his idealism: “There is nothing in the world but simple substances and in them perception and appetite” (AG 181).

By perception, Leibniz means the “passing state which involves and represents a multitude in the unity or in the simple substance” (M 14). Since each substance is metaphysically complete in itself and “like a world apart,” all changes in its state arise spontaneously, that is, without the intervention of other substances. Yet since each substance mirrors all others, it must contain a multiplicity of representations within itself. The sequence of spontaneous representations is what Leibniz calls perception. Importantly, Leibniz posits that all beings in the world perceive. This is yet another consequence of the fact that mutual representation is the only relation between monads in pre-established harmony. What distinguishes rational, conscious minds from all other substances is not perception, but apperception, or the ability to reflect on their mental processes.

Of appetite, Leibniz writes: “The action of the internal principle which brings about the change or passage from one perception to another can be called appetition; it is true that the appetite cannot always completely reach the whole perception toward which it tends, but it always obtains something of it. And reaches new perceptions” (M 15). The best analogy here is perhaps a mathematical function, where appetite is the analogue to the function equation, or the law of the series, and where each perception represents a discrete value. Leibniz’s point is that each substance has an orientation which defines it and which governs the transition between perceptions. This does not mean that each individual can fully choose or determine the sequence of its perceptions, since it is constrained by the need to faithfully represent the activity of other substances. Appetite does indicate, however, that there is a striving or tendency unique to each substance which shapes the manner in which it reflects the world. Hence Leibniz describes substances as so many distinct “viewpoints” on the universe (DM 14; M 57).

In composite substances, such as living animals whose various parts contribute to the well-being of the entire organism, simple monads unite under the direction of a dominant monad (M 70). Each monad retains its substantial independence, but living organisms display an especially high level of intermonadic harmony. Though Leibniz does not define in detail the operations of dominant monads, these monads must at least subsume others under their own internal principles or appetites. The activity of subordinate monads thereby serves the goals of the dominant monad. Conversely, subordinate monads must have particularly strong bearing on the perceptions of dominant monads, being, as it were, extensions of it. “There is nothing in the world but simple substances, and in them perception and appetite” may sound like a simple statement, but its simplicity should not mask the manifold degrees of coordination between the perceptions and appetites of monads.

e. The Nature of Body

It follows from Leibniz’s idealism that bodies are phenomenal. In other words, the physical world is the perception of perceiving monads. Leibniz is at pains, however, to insist that his system makes bodies “well-founded phenomena” (phenomena bene fundata). By this Leibniz means that bodies are not arbitrary perceptions lacking veracity. The pre-established harmony among all substances establishes a common realm of truth. Our perceptions thus provide us with knowledge of reality and serves as the starting point for empirical science.

Although “well-founded phenomena” might seem an empty expression within an idealist framework, it gains meaning from Leibniz’s commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, that is, the principle that nothing happens without reason or cause. For Leibniz, God’s rational ordering of creation certifies the reliability of sense perception, since God—the most rational of all minds—cannot do anything without having a reason for doing so. It would be arbitrary of God to give me this particular set of perceptions instead of some other set if it were not the case that my perceptions have some basis in other existing substances (NE 56). The thoroughgoing rational design of the world ensures that my perceptions indeed reflect the true order of things.

Defining bodies as “well-founded phenomena” leaves open the question of the relation of an individual’s mind to his own body. After all, my experience of my body seems qualitatively different than my perception of other things in the world. My arm, for example, moves upwards when I wish to remove my hat. Other bodies do not respond to my will in a like manner. Leibniz again invokes his theory of pre-established harmony to explain this apparent interaction between one’s mental and bodily states.

When I wish to raise my arm, it is precisely at the moment when everything is arranged in the body so as to carry this out, in such a manner that the body moves by virtue of its own laws; although it happens through the admirable but unfailing harmony between things that these things conspire towards that end precisely at the moment when the will is inclined to it, since God took it into consideration in advance, when he made his decision about the succession of all things in the universe. (LA 92)

Leibniz explains that God has arranged the world such that one’s mind and body do not directly influence each other, but nevertheless correspond perfectly at all moments. Leibniz is at pains to emphasize that the mind does not directly move the body because he wants to preserve the integrity of physics. Modern physics, relying on the principles of inertia and the conservation of force, requires that the motion of bodies be explained by other bodies. If minds directly influenced bodies, force could be added to the world at any time, and neither the principle of inertia nor the principle of conservation would hold. What causes the motion of my arm are the electrical impulses and synapses of my nervous system. The parallels between our desires and our bodily movements are instances not of interaction, but of harmony.

It is important to note that Leibniz sees the pre-established harmony between mind and body as following from his general theory of substance. Since minds are substantial and bodies phenomenal, my body is in one sense just a particularly distinct perception of my mind. In this sense, one’s perception of one’s body is not qualitatively different from one’s experience of other phenomena. Taking up Leibniz’s description of monads as various “viewpoints” on the universe, perhaps we can liken the body to one’s viewfinder, one’s lens on the universe, so long as we do not take the metaphor too literally by treating the body as an independent substance.

Though Leibniz adopts the language of “well-founded phenomena” to characterize bodies, scholars have debated the extent to which Leibniz’s idealism entails phenomenalism. The debate, put one way, is whether Leibniz makes bodies so “well-founded” that they have more reality than the term phenomena suggests. There is some consensus around the idea that Leibniz does not fully reduce bodies to perceptions, à la Berkeley, since bodies are aggregates of substantially real monads. Less certain is whether the substantial reality of monads makes labeling Leibniz a phenomenalist less apt. Given Leibniz’s insistence that “there is nothing in the world but [incorporeal] simple substances and in them perception and appetite” (AG 181) and his own use of the term phenomena, it seems most likely that Leibniz did not wish to accord bodies of aggregated monads the same metaphysical status as the monads comprising them. In short, monads are substantial, bodies are phenomenal, and Leibnizian idealism entails phenomenalism.

f. Efficient and Final Causality

Leibniz’s retrieval of the notion of substantial form blossomed into his idealist, monadic metaphysics and theory of pre-established harmony. Pre-established harmony mandates that the activity of bodies be explained by other bodies, not by minds. In explaining the activities of bodies, Leibniz makes a second major effort at reconciling ancient and modern thought. He mounts a defense of the utility of final causes in physics.

Aristotle distinguished between four causes, or four ways of accounting for the being of a thing. Philosophers of the 17th century found particularly objectionable the idea of final cause. The final cause of something indicates its purpose or goal. For instance, one might claim that the final cause of a tree is to grow upwards and reproduce. Thinkers such as Descartes, Hobbes, and Spinoza rejected the utility of final causes in explanations of the physical world, much as they rejected the utility of formal causes, or substantial forms. They restricted physics to the study of efficient causes, mechanical accounts of bodies in motion. We explain the growth of tree by looking to nutrient transfer from roots to branches, the exchange of compounds in respiration, the means of reproduction. To the moderns, any mention of tree’s purpose belongs to poetry, not physics.

Leibniz is as committed to mechanical explanation as his contemporaries, yet he bucks the 17th century trend of discrediting final causes outright. He reconciles the two approaches by offering a doctrine of double explanation. For Leibniz, events in nature are subject to explanation by either efficient or final causes. Leibniz does not adhere strictly to the Aristotelian notion of final cause any more than he adheres to the Aristotelian notion of substantial form. What Leibniz realizes, however, is that consideration of the end state of a physical process can often have as much predictive power as consideration of the motive forces involved. In §22 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz cites Fermat’s proof of the refraction law for light. Fermat derived the law by noting that light takes the easiest path, or the path of least resistance. In this sense, Fermat took note of the end or goal light rays achieve. By contrast, Descartes proved the same law solely by examining efficient causes, likening the refraction of light to bouncing tennis balls, and considering factors such as speed and mass. The refraction of light, Leibniz observes, can be explained and predicted under two separate causal paradigms.

Leibniz’s development of the calculus aids him greatly in his defense of final causes. Using what we would today call the variational calculus, Leibniz can show that change in nature happens at optimal points where the derivative vanishes. Systems thus tend towards certain end states and analyzing these states can furnish us with significant predictive power. Calculus permits Leibniz to tie discussions of final cause to mathematics, not poetics.

Although Leibniz finds both efficient and final causal explanations acceptable, he insists that they be kept separate. We ought not to invoke discussions of purpose simply when we lack a sufficient mechanical explanation. Final causes do not fill the gaps in our understanding of efficient causes; they provide another method of investigation entirely. Leibniz favors explanations by efficient causes, to be sure, as they open up great possibilities for engineering. Still, he considers either method a legitimate account of the world. Efficient causes, Leibniz likes to say, show us God’s power; final causes, by bringing to light the directedness and efficiency of nature, reveal God’s wisdom.

4. Theodicy

a. Leibniz’s Project

Leibniz ranks peace of mind as “the greatest cause of [his] philosophizing” (L 148). Central to Leibniz’s efforts to secure peace of mind is the thesis that we live in the best of all possible worlds, a position now commonly called Leibnizian optimism. Leibniz reasons that if we can assure ourselves that God acts in the best of all possible ways, then we can trust God’s justice and have true peace of mind. Of course, it is by no means self-evident that our world, which includes suffering and evil, is compatible with divine justice, nor is it self-evident what criteria could certify the world as “the best of all possible.” Leibniz thus devotes much argument to defending divine justice and coins the term “theodicy”—from the Greek words for God (theós) and justice (díkē)—to describe this project.

b. God

The thesis that God acts in the best of all possible ways follows from the notion of God as “an absolutely perfect being” (DM 1). Leibniz accepts Descartes’ ontological proof for the existence of God, which proves the existence of God by way of our idea of perfection, with one caveat. To Leibniz, Descartes leaves his proof open to the objection that God does not exist because God cannot exist. “An absolutely perfect being,” this objection posits, is a logical impossibility. So, Leibniz sets out to demonstrate that a single being can possess all perfections in a logically consistent manner. He bolsters the ontological proof by grounding the demonstration for God’s actuality in a demonstration of God’s possibility.

Leibniz clarifies what he means by “perfection” by stipulating that those properties incapable of a highest degree do not qualify as perfections. The “greatest of all numbers” is a contradiction, as is the “greatest of all figures,” since number and magnitude are infinitely continuous quantities. However, there is nothing inherently contradictory in “the highest degree of knowledge” or “the highest degree of power,” so omniscience and omnipotence are rightly considered divine perfections (DM 1). We can say a being possesses limitless knowledge and power without predicating meaningless, impossible attributes of God. Importantly for the purposes of an ontological proof, existence qualifies as perfection under Leibniz’s definition.

Leibniz argues for the compatibility of all perfections by further stipulating that by “perfection” he means a simple, positive quality (L 167). Once we recognize that perfections are simple qualities, Leibniz believes we easily arrive at the conclusion that there is nothing inherently contradictory in the idea of a perfect being. For, were two perfections incompatible, this fact would be evident either immediately or through an analysis of the perfections in question. In the case of perfections like knowledge and power, no immediate incompatibility presents itself. Yet, because these qualities are simple, they cannot be broken down into components which might be shown incompatible. Since the incompatibility of perfections can be shown neither in itself, nor through demonstration, Leibniz concludes that God is a logically possible being. And—following the logic of the ontological proof—if possible, God is necessary.

Leibniz does not disallow other, a posteriori proofs for God’s existence. To the contrary, he employs several such proofs in his writings. Since it turns so much on the idea of perfection, however, his defense of the ontological proof holds a special place in his theodicy and thus in his philosophy as a whole.

c. Possible Worlds and Optimism

As an absolutely perfect being, God acts in the most perfect fashion. To understand what this means for an account of creation and a defense of God’s justice, Leibniz turns to the idea of possible worlds. A possible world is any set of possible substances whose attributes are mutually consistent, or compatible, with one another. Monads whose mutual existence would not entail contradictions are said to be compossible and thus potential members of a common world. God, in his omniscience, surveys an infinite number of compossible sets of substances and chooses to create the optimal, or best possible, world

What characterizes the best possible world? By what criteria does God make his selection? In the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz writes that God selects that world which most effectively balances simplicity of means with richness of effects (DM 5). He likens God to a skilled architect who best employs the space and resources available to him, or a skilled geometer who finds the most elegant solution to a problem. Simplicity of means requires that there be order, efficiency, continuity, and intelligibility in the world. Richness of effects requires the maximization of both metaphysical and moral goodness. Metaphysical goodness denotes the amount of essence or perfection in the world, in short, the extent to which various creatures in the world imitate God’s inexhaustible essence. Maximizing metaphysical goodness therefore requires, at the very least, the creation of a great variety of creatures. Moral goodness refers to the happiness of rational beings, particularly the perfection and advancement of their rational faculties.

Much scholarship is devoted to determining precisely how Leibniz sees richness and simplicity coinciding in the best possible world. The task of interpretation gains complexity from the fact that Leibniz also speaks of God optimizing beauty and harmony, and even at times suggests that the best possible world progresses continually in perfection over time. Despite the difficulties in interpretation, it is clear that at the very least rational beings must inhabit an intelligible world. The perfections of rational beings interfere with one another least and thus are maximally compossible. Rarely does the knowledge and virtue of one person prevent or disallow the knowledge and virtue of another. By contrast, the beauty of a mountain range does preclude the beauty of plains at a given space and time. Because rational beings are capable of knowing God and entering into relationship with him, they are most responsible for maximizing metaphysical and moral goodness in the world. The intelligible order of creation aids them in this by making knowledge of various phenomena accessible through simple hypotheses.

Crucially, the existence of suffering does not count as proof against our world as being the best possible. By Leibniz’s lights, the goodness of the world as a whole does not require that each aspect of the world be choice worthy in itself. Pain and suffering find their place in the best possible world as “necessary evils” in maximizing its overall goodness. Here, the question of God’s justice arises and the true importance of possible worlds for Leibniz’s theodicy comes to light. How can God will to create pain and suffering? Does creating these not compromise divine justice? Leibniz responds that the divine will desires only what is good. The divine intellect takes, as it were, this desire for the good and determines how best to actualize it. The construction of the best possible world is the work of the divine intellect, and no more a matter of God’s will than the solution to an algebra equation depends on my will. God, Leibniz asserts, antecedently wills the good and consequently wills the best. God never wills evils in themselves, and never compromises his perfection, goodness, or justice. He accepts evil and suffering only insofar as they contribute to the overall goodness of the best possible world.

The distinction between what follows from the divine will and what follows from the divine intellect ultimately provides Leibniz with a means of upholding God’s perfection, despite the imperfections of creation. Were the conditions of the optimal world determined not by the divine intellect, but rather by arbitrary fiat, God would be no more than a despot and we would have no objective standard by which to judge his actions best. Were pain and suffering objects of the divine will per se, God would be cruel and unworthy of love. In other words, Leibniz believes he safeguards divine perfection by explaining that God is neither injudicious in thought nor vicious in will in creating the world as it is. Thus, assuring ourselves of God’s goodness and perfection is vital because “one cannot love God without knowing his perfections” (T 54) and loving God provides more happiness and peace of mind than any other activity. “To love is to find pleasure in the happiness of another. We love God himself above all things because the pleasure which we experience in contemplating the most beautiful being of all is greater than any conceivable joy” (L 134).

Leibniz insists that his optimism provides grounds for true joy and peace of mind, not simply the kind of disaffected, “grin and bear it” acquiescence commonly associated with the Stoics and—as Leibniz sees it—championed by Spinoza and Descartes. God does not what he must, but what is best. Whether or not Leibniz offers any greater consolation than the Stoics is an open question. Yet Leibniz believes that even if one cannot see the purpose of suffering, one can gain some measure of joy by contemplating, and advancing in knowledge of, God’s perfection.

Furthermore, because the theory of pre-established harmony among substances requires that all monads be created or destroyed collectively, Leibniz defends the immortality of monads. What we consider “life” is an active state of perception and appetite; what we consider “death” is simply dormancy. Leibniz, not unlike other Christian thinkers before him, maintains the hope that God will compensate for evils suffered by individuals over the full course of their existence, even if the purpose of those evils is not evident during their natural lifespans.

d. Freedom and Necessity

Leibniz’s theodicy raises two weighty sets of questions regarding freedom. The first concerns God’s freedom in creating. If the divine intellect objectively determines the design of the best possible world, should we not conclude that God is determined to create just this world? Is the notion of the divine will not meaningless, compromising the theological concept of grace? The second set of questions concerns human freedom. Since each individual substance contains all that can ever be predicated of it, and since God surveys the activity and interrelations of all monads in selecting the best possible world, it would seem that the entire course of history is set before the creation of the world. Does this mean that the idea of free will—and along with it theological concepts such as sin and redemption—is meaningless?

Leibniz takes these questions seriously throughout his career. His reflections trace at least to his Confession of a Philosopher of 1672-3. Section 13 of 1686’s Discourse on Metaphysics, which explores freedom and necessity, spurs his lengthy correspondence with Antoine Arnauld. And in the Theodicy of 1710, Leibniz calls the “labyrinth of freedom and necessity” one of the most perplexing questions facing humankind.

Though far from the first thinker to confront this “labyrinth,” Leibniz’s original contribution lies in his distinction between two kinds of necessity. Truths whose contraries imply a contradiction Leibniz calls “necessary per se.” Among these truths governed by the principle of non-contradiction, Leibniz includes the laws of arithmetic, geometry, and logic. Because these truths cannot be otherwise, not even to the divine intellect, Leibniz posits that they hold in all possible worlds. He thus refers to propositions necessary per se as “eternal verities.”

Truths which are certain, but whose contrary does not imply contradiction, Leibniz terms “necessary ex hypothesi.” The sequence of events in the world is necessary in this way. It is logically possible to conceive of the world being otherwise than it is. We create fictionalized accounts of reality in novels and dramas all the time; these accounts are entirely consistent in themselves. Because events in the world can be imagined otherwise, Leibniz believes they are in themselves contingent (contingent per se). Nevertheless, events in the world necessarily happen as they do on the presumption of (ex hypothesi) God’s selection of the best possible world. While the created world could be otherwise than it is, the optimal world could not be. Truths necessary ex hypothesi are governed by the principle of sufficient reason: God has a reason, a cause for creating the world in this way, namely, his desire for the best.

Leibniz locates a second method of distinguishing truths necessary per se from truths contingent per se in their respective manners of demonstration. The truth of a claim necessary per se, Leibniz writes, can be demonstrated a priori in a finite analysis, a proof with a finite number of steps. Think of Euclid’s demonstrations of the principles of geometry. Proving the truth of a contingent proposition, by contrast, requires an infinite analysis. To explain a priori why a given proposition about the world is true, one would have to take into account its harmony with all the other substances in the world, as well as account for why this set of substances was chosen out of the infinite number of possible worlds. Explanation would literally proceed ad infinitum. This is not to say that contingent truths are unknowable. God’s infinite intellect can presumably handle an infinite analysis and we know contingent truths a posteriori through experience. Infinitude of an analysis is a formal property of certain demonstrations, one Leibniz thinks suffices to distinguish necessary ex hypothesi from necessary per se truths.

With the distinction between the two kinds of necessity, Leibniz attempts to maintain meaningful notions of both divine and human freedom. Since God has infinitely many options among possible worlds, he cannot be said to be required in creating. One might object that God’s benevolent nature constrains and determines his action by forcing God to select the best world his intellect can design. Leibniz, however, counters that acting in accord with one’s nature and for the sake of the best is true freedom. One is only determined when constrained by outside forces. That God’s own nature leads him to create the best from among possible worlds makes him all the more free and worthy of praise.

Whether Leibniz is licensed to speak of human freedom is a thornier issue. Kant, in his Critique of Practical Reason, famously scoffs that Leibniz grants human beings nothing more than “the freedom of a turnspit” which, “once it is wound up, also accomplishes its movements of itself” (I.3; 5:97). Kant reasons that Leibniz’s monads, like any good machine, simply execute what they are programmed to do. To an extent, Kant is right. Leibniz does not entertain a notion of “free will,” if by this one means arbitrary and completely undetermined choice. The principle of sufficient reason banishes arbitrary choice. Human beings act in accord with their own natures, choosing what they deem best. My individual essence provides the reason for what I do

Yet while rejecting a voluntarist conception of free will, Leibniz nevertheless speaks of human freedom. We might reconstruct Leibniz’s reasoning in three steps. First, with the modal distinction between the two kinds of necessity, Leibniz insists that human choices are not necessary in the strong sense. Each truth about monads and their history is logically contingent. Leibniz, therefore, is not a logical determinist. He is however, an ontological determinist, insofar as all events are necessary given the composition of the world. Nevertheless—and this is the second step—the fact that each substance is causally independent of all other created substances makes each monad spontaneous. Spontaneity, to reiterate, refers to the fact that each state of a created substance follows from its preceding state without the direct influence of other substances; in this sense, each substance is “free.” Still, spontaneity is not what most people mean by human freedom. Human freedom—step three—comes with the fact that rational beings can gain knowledge of the causal principles governing the sequence of events in the world. Acting with knowledge does not make one less determined, but does make one less passive. One feels less at the mercy of inalterable forces when one understands these forces and can appreciate the principles of God’s design. The idea that increased activity and knowledge make an individual free owes much more to the conception of freedom developed by the Stoics and revived in the 17th century by Spinoza than it owes to voluntarist and Protestant conceptions of free will. As Leibniz sees it, his is the only conception of freedom compatible with divine perfection and worldly optimism.

5. Epistemology

a. Ideas and Knowledge

Leibniz’s epistemology begins with the distinction between clear and obscure ideas. An idea is clear when it allows one to recognize the thing represented, obscure when it does not. For example, one may have seen a gerbil and thus have an idea of what a gerbil is. However, if the next time she encounters a small rodent she cannot tell whether it is a gerbil or a hamster, then she possesses only an obscure idea of “gerbil.” By contrast, when one’s idea suffices to reliably distinguish one kind of object from others, then the idea is clear.

Leibniz divides clear ideas into two classes: confused and distinct. A clear idea is also distinct when one can catalogue all the marks, or criteria, distinguishing that idea from others. The animal physiologist can differentiate and enumerate those characteristics common to all rodents and those unique to gerbils. A child with a pet gerbil might not be able to do so and thus would have a clear but confused idea. Leibniz believes our sensory ideas, such as those of color, are clear and confused. Though we reliably distinguish blue from red, we cannot necessarily spell out the marks or causes which make one object blue and another red. We perceive colors without explaining them.

Leibniz proceeds to further classify clear and distinct ideas as either adequate or inadequate. If possessing an adequate idea, one has clear and distinct knowledge not only of the idea in question, but also of all its component parts. One has clear and distinct knowledge “all the way down” to the primitive concepts which compose the idea. Leibniz admits that he is unsure if any human being possesses an adequate idea, but believes our arithmetical knowledge most nearly approaches adequacy. In all other cases, where one cannot carry out comprehensive analyses down to primitive concepts, one has clear, distinct, yet inadequate ideas.

At its highest reaches, knowledge is not only adequate, but also intuitive. Intuitive knowledge is both adequate and non-discursive. That is, one clearly and distinctly knows all the ingredients of an idea and grasps these simultaneously. As is the case with all adequate knowledge, intuitive knowledge seems more suited to divine knowers than to human knowers, as the latter cannot think about all the components of a complex concept at once.

One consequence of Leibniz’s taxonomy of knowledge is that it provides Leibniz with a means of explaining sense perception. Given Leibniz’s idealism, all that exists in the world are monads and their mental states. Bodies are phenomenal and therefore not sources of knowledge. What, then, is sense perception? Is there any real difference between sensation and intellection if all ideas follow spontaneously from a monad’s own concept, with no interaction between monads? Leibniz answers such questions by noting that what we commonly experience as sense perceptions are simply confused ideas. Even if they are clear, sense perceptions are necessarily confused. Though these perceptions arise spontaneously in the perceiving subject, they express the harmony between a given monad and all others; it is therefore impossible to enumerate all the contributing factors to any given sense perception, most of which fall below the threshold of consciousness (DM 33). With the category of clear and confused ideas, Leibniz can meaningfully retain the distinction between sensation and intellection without compromising the basic tenets of his idealism.

Leibniz’s approach to ideas and knowledge separates him in some key respects from his fellow 17th century rationalists. The division between distinctness and adequacy leads Leibniz to differentiate between nominal and real definitions. Nominal definitions include distinct knowledge; they sufficiently identify the defining marks of a concept. Yet they do not ensure that the concept is possible. It could be that a concept is internally inconsistent, a fact which would be revealed if one had adequate knowledge of all its parts. Real definitions account for the possibility of a thing, either by citing experience or through a priori demonstration. In his discussion of definition, Leibniz seeks to modify Hobbes’ strong nominalism in which all truth is dependent on the relationship between names and definitions. There is a higher level of knowledge than that contained in nominal definitions, one which accounts for possible existence in reality.

Hobbes is not Leibniz’s only rationalist target. Leibniz believes he improves upon Descartes’ maxim that all clearly and distinctly perceived ideas are true by delineating better criteria for clarity and distinctness. To Leibniz, Descartes construes clarity and distinctness as something like immediately perceived qualities, ripe for misevaluation.

b. Innate Ideas

In the New Essays on Human Understanding, Leibniz takes aim at Locke’s depiction of the mind as a tabula rasa, or blank tablet, needing external impressions to furnish it with the contents of its reasoning. In opposition to this conception of the mind and cognition, Leibniz affirms the existence of innate ideas. In one sense, Leibniz’s theory of substance obviously commits him to some conception of innate ideas. If monads have no “windows” through which they interact with other substances, then of course all their ideas must have an internal, innate origin.

But Leibniz does not rest his defense of innate ideas on his theory of substance. Rather, he advances fairly traditional epistemological arguments regarding the nature of deductive, a priori truths. Empirical knowledge can show that something is the case but cannot show that something is necessarily the case. The human mind, however, has knowledge of necessary truths, such as the laws of arithmetic and geometry. These necessary truths, which Leibniz calls “truths of reason,” are ideas whose opposite is impossible. They are the eternal truths which obtain in all possible worlds. Because truths of reason are known solely through the principle of non-contradiction and require no empirical data, Leibniz concludes that they are innate to the mind. Leibniz contrasts innate ideas with “truths of fact,” contingent truths whose opposite is possible and knowledge of which requires experience.

The theory of innate ideas does not imply that all minds have equal awareness of the truths of reason. Ideas are innate in us not as actualities, but “as inclinations, dispositions, tendencies, or natural potentialities” (NE 52). Accessing truths of reason requires effort. Yet the presence of innate ideas does incline us towards their discovery. In one particularly apt metaphor, Leibniz claims that rational minds are not like blank tablets, but like veined pieces of marble, disposed to be cut and polished in determinate ways.

c. Petites Perceptions

One of the more original elements of Leibniz’s epistemology is his theory of petites perceptions.

There are hundreds of indications leading us to conclude that at every moment there is in us an infinity of perceptions, unaccompanied by awareness or reflection; that is, of alterations in the soul itself, of which we are unaware because these impressions are either too minute and too numerous, or else too unvarying, so that they are not sufficiently distinctive on their own. But when they are combined with others they do nevertheless have their effect and make themselves felt, at least confusedly, within the whole. (NE 53)

Leibniz posits that at any given time, the mind has not only the thoughts of which it is aware, but also innumerable small, insensible perceptions, which he calls petites perceptions.

Leibniz wagers that there are “hundreds of indications” pointing to existence of petites perceptions. Regardless of whether this is hyperbole, there are at least a few good reasons Leibniz includes these perceptions in his theory. For one, petites perceptions follow from the theory of pre-established harmony, both the harmony between all substances and the harmony between mind and body. Each monad mirrors the activity of all others at all moments. This mirroring takes place via mutual representation. Since no mind, at any given moment, has conscious awareness of all other substances, mutual representation must be taking place at insensible levels via petites perceptions. Moreover, the pre-established harmony between mind and body requires that mental activity express and run parallel to bodily activity. However, one is often insensitive to one’s bodily processes. In order to maintain the perfect parallelism between body and mind, therefore, we must conclude that the mind has petites perceptions of the body’s activity.

Even more fundamentally, the existence of petites perceptions follows from Leibniz’s understanding of substance. It is of a piece with the thesis that “there is nothing in the world but simple substances and in them perception and appetite.” Activity, more specifically perception, is the mark of any substance. That the mind has petites perceptions explains how it remains active and substantial even in dreamless sleep or after death.

Petites perceptions also help to explain the workings of appetite. Appetite determines the transition from one perception to the next, a transition which oftentimes seems sudden and episodic. For instance, one might jump immediately from thinking of one’s mother to thinking of Beethoven’s fifth symphony. On its face, this transition violates the principle of continuity, which states that no discontinuous change occurs. Nature—including rational nature—makes no leaps, has no gaps. The theory of petites perceptions accounts for apparent leaps in perception. What appears a discontinuous change in thought is actually determined by the continuous workings and interactions of infinitely many insensible perceptions.

Finally, petites perceptions help to explain what is confused in a confused idea, particularly in sense perceptions. The difficulty in explaining all the marks of a sensation comes from the many petites perceptions which contribute to it. “These minute perceptions…constitute that je ne sais quoi, those flavors, those images of sensible qualities, vivid in the aggregate but confused as to the parts; those impressions which are made on us by the bodies around us and which involve the infinite; that connection each of us has with the rest of the universe” (NE 54-5).

d. Reflection, Memory, Selfhood

All substances are incorporeal and perceptive. For this reason, Leibniz understands all substances on analogy to human minds or souls. Leibniz reserves the proper use of the term “soul,” however, for higher order substances with particular cognitive capacities. Souls not only perceive, but also apperceive. That is, they not only perceive objects, but also think about and reflect on themselves. They have the added capacity to remember past perceptions. These abilities to reflect and remember provide souls with a sense of self, an understanding of the “I.” As a result, souls have moral identities. Moral identity goes beyond the substantial identity over time that all monads have; moral identity requires that one can remember his past actions, recognize himself as the selfsame individual over time, and therefore assume responsibility for his character.

Reflection and memory make souls not just moral beings, but intellectual beings as well. Leibniz observes that self-reflection serves as the starting point for all metaphysical and philosophical thinking. Each soul is, as it were, its own principal innate idea. Studying one’s own nature leads one to form and investigate fundamental metaphysical ideas. “In thinking of ourselves, we think of being, of substance, of the simple and the composite, of the immaterial, and of God himself, by conceiving that that which is limited in us is limitless in him. And these reflective acts furnish the principle objects of our reasonings” (M 30).

Because of their moral and intellectual capacities, Leibniz likens souls to “little divinities” (M 30). Leibniz expresses the near divinity of rationality rather poignantly in the Theodicy:

This portion of reason which we possess is a gift of God and consists in the natural light that has remained with us in the midst of corruption; thus it is in accordance with the whole, and it differs from that which is in God only as a drop of water differs from the ocean, or rather as the finite from the infinite. (T 169)

Though every substance reflects God and his plan for the cosmos, rational souls are mirrors of God in a heightened way, being able to understand the nature of things, reflect on God’s works, and ultimately enter into relationship with him (M 83-84).

6. Ethics

Of the traditional major content areas of philosophy, ethics is perhaps the only one to which Leibniz is generally not considered to have made significant contribution. Certainly he does not share the reputation as an ethicist enjoyed by early modern thinkers Spinoza, Hume, and Kant, nor does he share the influence in political philosophy had by Locke and Hobbes. Leibniz himself, however, took great interest in the ethical dimensions of his thought. He engaged in central debates of the day regarding the foundations of justice and the possibility of altruistic love. Furthermore, all his thinking has a clear ethical bent, with the peace of mind sought by his optimism a prime example of this. While Leibniz’s ethical contributions do not match his metaphysics in scope or originality, when it comes to a thinker as singular as Leibniz, this fact alone should not discourage inquiry into his ethics.

a. Intellect and Will

Leibniz’s approach to ethics is, broadly speaking, intellectualist in nature. That is, Leibniz sees moral goodness as increasing in line with knowledge. He defines will as “the inclination to do something in proportion to the good it contains” (T 139). Hence, the more knowledge one has of the goodness of a particular object or act, the better one’s will is directed. Loving and desiring the right kinds of things follows from proper understanding. Perfecting the intellect, in short, accomplishes the perfection of the will.

Perfecting the intellect also brings about happiness. “It is obvious,” Leibniz writes, “that the happiness of mankind consists in two things—to have the power, as far as permitted, to do what it wills and to know what, from the nature of things, ought to be willed. Of these, mankind has almost achieved the former; as to the latter, it has failed in that it is particularly impotent with respect to itself” (L130). Despite Leibniz’s dour diagnosis of humanity’s understanding of perfection, his prognosis is encouraging. He does not see happiness as particularly difficult to achieve. One need only pursue and acquire knowledge of the nature of things.

The close alliance Leibniz sees between intellect and will has the further consequence of ruling out indifference of equipoise, a topic of much debate in the 17th century At issue in discussions of this “indifference” is the question of whether one’s will can be in complete suspension when faced with two or more options, without inclination one way or another. The purported phenomenon of indifference of equipoise was taken at the time as evidence of the will’s independence from the intellect and even of its capacity for free, uncaused choice.

Leibniz rejects indifference of equipoise on grounds of the principle of sufficient reason. Uncaused events are incomprehensible; all events, including acts of the will, have some explanation. Here the deeper significance of Leibniz’s account of the will comes to light: one’s knowledge of the goodness of things provides the reason the will chooses as it does. Still, one might ask, could not the will be in equilibrium when faced with two objects of equal goodness? No. Per the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, each substance in the world has a unique complete concept which mirrors God and creation in a unique way; no two substances, no two states of affairs, are equivalent in goodness. One’s intellect and will therefore cannot respond identically to two different options. Though we may sometimes feel completely indifferent and unable to articulate the reasons for a choice, Leibniz insists that it would be a mistake to think of the choice as uncaused or of the will as uninclined. Infinitely many petites perceptions are at work in one’s mind at all times; much like machines, our movements are the result of all the tendencies and inclinations within us, even those of which we are unaware. Thus, we should not champion arbitrary choice by citing indifference of equipoise, but rather become freer, more self-aware moral beings through progress in knowledge.

b. Justice and Charity

Leibniz sees the study of justice as an a priori science of the good. There is, that is, an objective, rational basis for justice. Though Leibniz wrote much regarding the positive laws of states, he does not see positive law as the foundation of justice. He rejects the position that justice has no firmer foundation than the fiat of those in power, a position Leibniz often mentions in conjunction with Thrasymachus from Plato’s Republic but more pointedly associates with Samuel von Pufendorf and Thomas Hobbes. Taken to its logical conclusion, this position results in divine command theory: certain principles are just simply because God, the most powerful of all legislators, has posited they be so. For Leibniz, this line of thinking violates God’s perfection. God acts in the most perfect way and thus acts with good reason, not by arbitrary fiat. He is perfect not only in power, but also in wisdom. God’s perfect will follows upon his perfect intellect no less than the will of any rational being follows upon her intellect. The a priori, eternal standard of justice to which God himself adheres provides the basis for a theory of natural law.

Leibniz defines justice as the charity of the wise person. Though this may seem unique, or even odd, to those accustomed to seeing justice and charity contrasted, what is truly original in Leibniz’s rooting justice in charity is his very definition of charity, or love. In the 17th C., there were a series of debates regarding the possibility of disinterested love. Each creature, it would seem, acts to preserve and advance its own being. Hobbes and Spinoza employed the term conatus to refer to the striving each being has to persist in its own being and made it the foundation of their respective psychologies. On this view, one loves what one finds pleasing, that is, what one finds conducive to his own persistence. Love is reduced to a kind of egoism which, even where benevolent, nevertheless lacks an altruistic component.

Leibniz attempts to obviate the tension between egoism and altruism by defining love as taking pleasure in the happiness, or perfection, of another. With this definition, Leibniz does not deny the fundamental drive all creatures have for pleasure and self-interest, but ties it to altruistic concern for the well-being of others. The coincidence of altruism and self-interest defines love and captures the essence of justice. Justice is the charity of the wise person and the wise person, Leibniz goes on to say, loves all. Leibniz’s basic contention is that to be just is to show the love attended by insight that God shows. Ethics involves seeking the good of all in a prudent way, such that the good of each individual is pursued only insofar as it is compatible with the whole. One cannot love all when obtaining the happiness of one person at the expense of another’s, nor would this be desirable, since Leibniz believes we find more pleasure in harmony than discord. The kind of universal love demanded by Leibniz’s definition of justice is nurtured by reflection on the universal harmony between all things. Leibniz believes that appreciating the harmonious order of the cosmos can lead individuals to find pleasure in increasing the perfection and happiness of all who share in that order.

Leibniz’s definition of love also entails that loving God is the highest end of rational beings. If love is finding pleasure in the perfection of another, then loving an infinitely perfect being affords the greatest possible pleasure and happiness.

To love is to find pleasure in the happiness of another. We love God himself above all things because the pleasure which we experience in contemplating the most beautiful being of all is greater than any conceivable joy. (L 134)

Since the harmony of the world mirrors God’s perfection, Leibniz’s conception of justice does not place love of God at odds with love of others. We should take pleasure in perfection wherever we discern it. Justice as the charity of the wise person means that love of God and love of neighbor are one. By identifying justice with love of God and harmony between all, Leibniz brings to fruition the ethical implications of his metaphysical inquiries into God’s perfection and pre-established harmony. Ethics and metaphysics are, for Leibniz, never far apart.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources: Leibniz Texts and Translations

The standard critical edition of Leibniz’s writings is G.W. Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, edited by the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften (Berlin: Academy Verlag, 1923- ). The Akademie edition is still in production. Other useful editions of Leibniz’s writings in their original languages are those of C. I. Gerhardt (Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz. 7 vols. 1875-1890) and Ludovici Dutens (Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Opera Omnia. Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag, 1989).

References in this article to Leibniz’s works use the following abbreviations and translations:

AG     G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.

DM      Discourse on Metaphysics, as translated by Ariew and Garber in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Passages from the Discourse are cited by section number.

G         Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin. 7 vols. 1875-1890.

L        G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited and translated by Leroy E. Loemker. 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989.

LA      The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence. Edited by H.T. Mason. Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1967.

M        Monadology, as translated by Ariew and Garber in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Passages from the Monadology are cited by section number.

NE       New Essays on Human Understanding. Edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathan Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

T          Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man, and the Problem of Evil. Translated by E.M. Huggard. BiblioBazaar, 2007.

Other helpful collections of Leibniz’s writings in English include:

  • The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence. Edited by H.G. Alexander. New York: Philosophical Library, 1956.
  • The Labyrinth of the Continuum: Writings on the Continuum Problem, 1672-1686. Edited by Richard W. T. Arthur. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2002.
  • The Leibniz-Des Bosses Correspondence. Edited by Brandon C. Look and Donald Rutherford. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2007.
  • Leibniz: Logical Papers. Edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1966.
  • De Summa Rerum: Metaphysical Papers, 1675-1676. Edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1992.
  • Leibniz: Political Writings. Edited by Patrick Riley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Confessio Philosophi: Papers Concerning the Problem of Evil, 1671-1678. Edited by Robert C. Sleigh, Jr. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2005.
  • Leibniz and the Two Sophies: The Philosophical Correspondence. Edited by Lloyd Strickland. Toronto: Iter, Inc., 2011.
  • Leibniz’s ‘New System’ and Associated Contemporary Texts. Edited by R.S. Woolhouse and Richard Francks. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997.

b. Secondary Sources

i. Introductory Texts

  • Antognazza, Maria Rosa. Leibniz: An Intellectual Biography. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
  • Arthur, Richard T.W. Leibniz. Cambridge: Polity Press, 2014.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. Leibniz. New York: Routledge, 2005.
  • Perkins, Franklin. Leibniz: A Guide for the Perplexed. New York: Continuum, 2007.
  • Savile, Anthony. Routledge Guidebook to Leibniz and the Monadology.New York: Routledge, 2000.

ii. More Advanced Studies

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press,  1994.
  • Garber, Daniel. Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Ishiguro, Hidé. Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1975.
  • Mercer, Christia. Leibniz’s Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Parkinson, G.H.R. Logic and Reality in Leibniz’s Metaphysics. Cambridge: Oxford University Press, 1965.
  • Rescher. Nicholas. Leibniz’s Metaphysics of Nature. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1981.
  • Riley, Patrick. Leibniz’s Universal Jurisprudence: Justice as the Charity of the Wise. Harvard University Press, 1996.
  • Rutherford, Donald. Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Sleigh, Robert C. Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on their Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
  • Smith, Justin E.H. Divine Machines: Leibniz and the Sciences of Life. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2011.
  • Strickland, Lloyd. Leibniz Reinterpreted. London: Continuum, 2006.
  • Wilson, Catherine. Leibniz’s Metaphysics: A Historical and Comparative Study. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989.

iii. Collected Essays 

  • Brown, Stuart, ed. The Young Leibniz and his Philosophy (1646-76). Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1999.
  • Jorgensen and Newlands, eds. New Essays on Leibniz’s Theodicy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
  • Jolley, Nicholas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz. edited by Nicholas Jolley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Rutherford and Cover, eds. Leibniz: Nature and Freedom. New York: Oxford University Press, 2005.


Author Information

Edward W. Glowienka
Carroll College
U. S. A.

History of African Philosophy

This article traces the history of systematic African philosophy from the early 1920’s to 2014. In Plato’s Theaetetus, Socrates suggests that philosophy begins with wonder. Aristotle agreed. However, the pattern of discourse in the history of systematic African philosophy which began in the 1920s suggests that African philosophy began with frustration and not with wonder.

This frustration, according to Ruch and Anyanwu (1981:184-85), was due to historical events such as slavery, colonialism and racism that generated frustration with European philosophy. This eventually led to angry questions and then responses and reactions out of which African philosophy emerged. These reactions led to a great debate and then to more questions and reactions. So began the on-going spiral of arguments. The frustration was borne out of colonial caricature of Africa as culturally naïve, intellectually docile and rationally inept; the caricature was created by European scholars such as Kant, Hegel and, much later, Levy-Bruhl. It was the reaction to this caricature that led African scholars returning from Europe into philosophizing, The frustration about this treatment of Africa influences African philosophers to this day. It has a wider implication that touches on sensitive issues such as the identity of the African people, their place in history, and their contributions to civilization. To dethrone and undercut the colonially-built episteme became a ready attraction for African scholars’ vexed frustrations. Thus began the history of systematic African philosophy with the likes of Aimer Cisaire, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah, Julius Nyerere, William Abraham, John Mbiti and expatriates such as Placid Tempels, Janheinz Jahn and George James.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Criteria of African Philosophy
  3. Schools of African Philosophy
    1. Ethnophilosophy School
    2. Nationalist/Ideological School
    3. Philosophic Sagacity
    4. Hermeneutical School
    5. Literary School
    6. Professional School
    7. Conversational School
  4. The Movements in African Philosophy
    1. Excavationism
    2. Afro-Constructionism/Afro-Deconstructionism
    3. Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism
    4. Conversationalism
  5. Periods of African Philosophy
    1. Early Period
    2. Middle Period
    3. Later Period
    4. New Era
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

African philosophy as a systematic study has a very short history. This history is also a very dense one, since actors sought to do in a few decades what would have been better done in many centuries.As a result, they also did in later years what ought to have been done earlier and vice versa, thus making the early and the middle epochs overlap considerably. The reason for this overtime endeavor is not far-fetched. Soon after colonialism, actors realized that Africa had been sucked into the global matrix unprepared. During colonial times, the identity of the African was European, his thought system, standard and even his perception were structured by the colonial shadow which stood towering behind him. It was easy for the African to position himself within these Western cultural appurtenances even though they had no real-time connection with his being.

The vanity of this presupposition and the emptiness of colonial assurances manifested soon after the towering colonial shadow vanished. Now, in the global matrix it became shameful for the African to continue to identify himself within the European colonialist milieu. For one, he had just rejected colonialism and for another, the deposed European colonialist made it clear that the identity of the African was no longer covered and insured by the European medium. So, actors realized all too sudden they had been disillusioned and had suffered severe self-deceit under colonial temper. The question which trailed every African was, “Who are you?” Of course, the answers from European perspective were savage, primitive, less than human, etc. It was the urgent, sudden need to contradict these European positions that led the post-colonial Africans in search of African identity. So, to discover or rediscover African identity in order to initiate a non-colonial or original history for Africa in the global matrix and start a course of viable economic, political and social progress that is entirely African became the focal point of African philosophy.

Placid Tempels, the European missionary, wounded by this pitiable African condition elected to help and in his controversial book, Bantu Philosophy, sought to create Africa’s own philosophy as proof that Africa has its own peculiar identity and thought system, that the African is not a nobody but somebody, that he is not savage or primitive or even less than human. However, it was George James, another concerned European who attempted a much more ambitious project in his work, Stolen Legacy. In this work, there were strong suggestions not only that Africa has philosophy but that the so-called Western philosophy, the very bastion of European identity, was stolen from Africa. This claim was intended to make the proud European colonialists feel indebted to the humiliated Africans, but it was unsuccessful. That Greek philosophy had roots in Egypt does not imply, as some Europeans claims, that Egyptians were black nor that black Africans had philosophy. The use of the term “Africans” in this work is in keepingwith George James’ demarcation which precludes the Caucasian people of North Africa and refers to the black people of southern Sahara.

After these two Europeans, Africans began to attain maturation. Aimer Cesaire, John Mbiti, Odera Oruka, Julius Nyerere, Leopold Senghor, Nnamdi Azikiwe, Kwame Nkrumah, Obafemi Awolowo, Alexis Kegame, Uzodinma Nwala, Emmanuel Edeh, Innocent Onyewuenyi, and Henry Olela, to name just a few, opened the doors of ideas. A few of the works produced sought to prove and establish the philosophical basis of African, unique identity in the history of mankind, while others sought to chart a course of Africa’s true identity through unique political and economic ideologies. Some of these works were written belatedly when the early epoch had rolled over to the middle epoch of African philosophy, such as Nwala’s Igbo Philosophy, Edeh’s Igbo Metaphysics, Olela’s, Onyewuenyi’s, Anyanwu’s and Ruch’s works, etc., to explain the position that the history of African philosophy was so dense that the two epochs overlapped considerably. The criterion for identifying where each work belongs remains the focus of much debate. The ones that seek to prove or establish Africa’s unique identity belong to the early period whereas the ones that seek to clarify, justify or criticize or deny Africa’s peculiar identity belong to the middle period. The relationship can be seen between the philosophical concerns of the early and middle periods of African philosophy.

For its concerns, the middle era of African philosophy is characterized by the great debate. Those who seek to clarify and justify the position held in the early epoch and those who seek to criticize and deny the viability of such position entangled themselves in a great debate. Some of the actors on this front include, C. S. Momoh, Robin Horton, Henri Maurier, Lacinay Keita, Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, Kwame Gyekye, Richard Wright, Barry Halen, Joseph Omoregbe, C. B. Okolo, Theophilus Okere, Paulin Hountondji, Gordon Hunnings, Odera Oruka and A. F. Uduigwomen to name a few.

The preceding epoch eventually gave way to the later period which has as its focus the construction of an African episteme. Two camps rivaled each other, namely the Critical Reconstructionists who are the evolved Universalists/Deconstructionists and the Eclectics who are the evolved Traditionalists/Excavators. The former seek to build an African episteme untainted by ethnophilosophy; whereas, the latter seek to do the same by a delicate fusion of relevant ideals of the two camps. In the end, Critical Reconstructionism ran into a brick wall when it became clear that whatever it produces cannot truly be called African philosophy if it is all Western without African marks. The mere claim that it would be African philosophy simply because it would be produced by Africans (Hountondji 1996 and Oruka 1975) collapses like a pack of cards under any argument. For this great failure, the influence of Critical Reconstructionism in the later period whittled down and it was latter absorbed by its rival—Eclecticism.

The works of the Eclectics heralded the emergence of the New Era in African philosophy. The focus becomes the Conversational philosophizing, or Conversationalism, in which the production of philosophically rigorous and formidable African episteme better than what the Eclectics produced occupied the center stage. It is eclectic in that the ideals of traditional and universal African philosophy are combined. But above all, it is conversational eschewing perverse dialogues and concentrating on individual creativity, originality and reconstruction.

The sum of what historians of African philosophy have done can be presented in the following two broad categorizations to wit; Pre-systematic Era and the Systematic era. The former refers to Africa’s philosophical culture, thoughts of the anonymous African thinkers and may include the problems of Egyptian legacy. The latter refers to the periods marking the return of Africa’s first eleven, Western-tutored philosophers from the 1920’s to date. This latter category could further be delineated into four periods:

    1. Early period 1920s - 1960s
    2. Middle period 1960s - 1980s
    3. Later period 1980s - 1990s
    4. New (Contemporary) Era since 1990s

Note, of course, that this does not commit us to saying that, before the early period, people in Africa never philosophized—they did.  But one fact that must not be denied is that they did not document their thoughts and, as such, scholars cannot attest to their systematicity or sources. In other words, what this periodization shows is that African philosophy as a system first began in the late 1920s.

Because there are credible objections among African philosophers with regards to the inclusion of it in the historical chart of African philosophy, the Egyptian question will be ignored for now. The main objection is that even if the philosophers of stolen legacy were able to prove a connection between Greece and Egypt, they could not prove in concrete terms that Egyptians were black Africans or that black Africans were Egyptians. It is understandable the frustration and desperation that motivated such ambitious effort in the ugly colonial era which was captured above, but any man of reason, judging by the responses of time and events in the last few decades knows it was high time Africans parted ways with that unproven legacy and let go of that now helpless propaganda.  If however, some would want to retain it as part of African philosophy, it would carefully fall within the pre-literate or the pre-systematic era.

In this essay, discussion will focus on the history of systematic or literate African philosophy touching prominently on the criteria, schools, movements and periods in African philosophy. As much as the philosophers of a given era may disagree, they are inevitably united by the problem of their epoch. That is to say, it is orthodoxy that each epoch is defined by a common focus or problem. Therefore, the approach of the study of the history of philosophy can be done either through personality periscope or through the periods, but whichever approach one chooses, he unavoidably runs into the man who had chosen the other. This is a sign of unity of focus. Thus philosophers are those who seek to solve the problem of their time. In this presentation, the study of the history of African philosophy will be approached principally through the periods, schools, movements and only discuss the personalities within these purviews. 

2. Criteria of African Philosophy

To start with, more than three decades debate on the status of philosophy ended with the affirmation that African philosophy exists. But what is it that makes a philosophy African? Answers to this question polarized actors into two main groups, namely the Traditionalists and Universalists. Whereas the Traditionalists aver that the studies of the philosophical elements in world-view of the people constitute African philosophy, the Universalists insist that it has to be a body of analytic and critical reflections of individual African philosophers. Further probing of the question was done during the debate by the end of which the question of what makes a philosophy “African” produced two contrasting criteria. First, as a racial criterion; a philosophy would be African if it is produced by Africans. This is the view held by people like Paulin Hountondji, Odera Oruka (in part), early Peter Bodunrin, Godfrey Ozumba and Innocent Asouzu, derived from the two constituting terms—“African” and “philosophy”. African philosophy following this criterion is the philosophy done by Africans. This has been criticized as pejorative, incorrect and exclusivist. Second, as a tradition criterion; a philosophy is “African” if it designates a non-racial-bound philosophy tradition where the predicate “African” is treated as a solidarity term of no racial import and where the approach derives inspiration from African cultural background or system of thought. It does not matter whether the issues addressed are African or done by an African insofar as it has universal applicability and projected from the purview of African system of thought. African philosophy would then be that rigorous discourse of African issues or any issues whatsoever from the critical eye of African system of thought. Actors like Odera Oruka (in part), Meinrad Hebga, C. S. Momoh, Udo Etuk, Joseph Omoregbe, the later Peter Bodunrin, Jonathan Chimakonam can be grouped here. This criterion has also been criticized as courting uncritical elements of the past when it makes reference to the controversial idea of African logic tradition. Further discussion on this is well beyond the scope of this essay. What is however common in the two criteria is that African philosophy is a critical discourse on issues that may or may not affect Africa by African philosophers—the purview of this discourse remains unsettled.

3. Schools of African Philosophy

a. Ethnophilosophy School

This is the foremost school in systematic African philosophy which equated African philosophy with culture-bound systems of thought. For this, their enterprise was scornfully described as substandard hence the term “ethnophilosophy.” Thoughts of the members of the Excavationism movement properly belong here and their high point was in the early period of African philosophy. 

b. Nationalist/Ideological School

The concern of this school was nationalist philosophical jingoism to combat colonialism and to create political philosophy and ideology for Africa from the indigenous traditional system as a project of decolonization. Thoughts of members of the Excavationism movement in the early period can be brought under this school. 

c. Philosophic Sagacity

There is also the philosophical sagacity school whose main focus is to show that standard philosophical discourse existed and still exists in traditional Africa and can only be discovered through sage conversations. The chief proponent of this school was the brilliant Kenyan philosopher Odera Oruka who took time to emphasize that Marcel Gruaile’s similar programme is less sophisticated than his.  But since philosophical sagacity thrives on the method of oral interview of presumed sages whose authenticity cannot be independently verified, what is produced distances itself from the sages and becomes the fruits of the interviewing philosopher. So the sage connection and the tradition became defeated. Their enterprise falls within the movement of Critical Reconstructionism of the later period.

d. Hermeneutical School

Another prominent school is the hermeneutical school. Its focus is that the best approach to studying African philosophy is through interpretations of oral traditions and emerging philosophical texts. Theophilus Okere and Okonda Okolo are some of the major proponents of this school. The confusion however is that they reject ethnophilosophy whereas the oral tradition and most of the texts available for interpretation are ethnophilosophical in nature. The works of Okere and Okolo feasted on ethno-philosophy. This school exemplifies the movement called Afro-constructionism of the middle period. 

e. Literary School

The literary school’s main concern is to make a philosophical presentation of African cultural values through literary/fictional ways. Proponents like Chinua Achebe, Cheik Anta Diop, Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Wole Soyinka to name a few have been outstanding. Yet critics have found it convenient to identify their discourse with ethnophilosophy from literary angle thereby denigrating it as sub-standard. Their enterprise remarks the movement of Afro-constructionism of the middle period.

f. Professional School

Perhaps the most controversial is the one variously described as professional, universalist or modernist school. It contends that all the other schools are engaged in one form of ethnophilosophy or the other, that standard African philosophy is critical, individual discourse and that what qualifies as African philosophy must have universal merit and thrive on the method of critical analysis and individual discursive enterprise. It is not about talking, it is about doing. Some staunch unrepentant members of this school include Kwasi Wiredu, Paulin Hountondji, Peter Bodunrin to name a few. They demolished all that has been built in African philosophy and built nothing as an alternative episteme. This school champions the movement of Afro-deconstructionism and the abortive Critical Reconstructionism of the middle and later periods respectively.

Perhaps, one of the deeper criticisms that can be leveled against the position of the professional school comes from C. S. Momoh’s scornful description of the school as African logical neo-positivism. They agitate that (1) there is nothing as yet in African traditional philosophy that qualifies as philosophy and (2) that critical analysis should be the focus of African philosophy; so what then is there to be critically analyzed? Professional school adherents are said to forget in their overt copying of European philosophy that analysis is a recent development in European philosophy which attained saturation in the 19th century after over 2000 years of historical evolution thereby requiring some downsizing. Would they also grant that philosophy in Europe before 19th century was not philosophy? The aim of this essay is not to offer criticisms of the schools but to present historical journey of philosophy in the equatorial (African) tradition. It is in opposition to and the need to fill the lacuna in the enterprise of the professional school that the new school which can be called conversational school has recently emerged in African philosophy.

g. Conversational School

This emerging school thrives on fulfilling the yearning of the professional/modernist school to have a robust individual discourse as well as fulfilling the conviction of the traditionalists that a thorough-going African philosophy has to be erected on the foundation of African thought systems. They make the most of the criterion which presents African philosophy as a critical tradition that projects individual discourses from the thought system of Africa. Some prominent members of this school include Pantaleon Iroegbu, Bruce Janz, Jonathan Chimakonam, Jennifer Vest, Innocent Asouzu and Ada Agada to name a few. Their projects promote partly the movements of Afro-eclecticism and fully the conversationalism of the later, new period respectively.

4. The Movements in African Philosophy

There are four main movements that can be identified in the history of African philosophy, they include: Excavationism, Afro-constructionism/Afro-deconstructionism, Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism and Conversationalism. 

a. Excavationism

The Excavators are all those who sought to erect the edifice of African philosophy by systematizing the African cultural world-views. Some of them aimed at retrieving and reconstructing presumably lost African identity from the raw materials of African culture. While others sought to develop compatible political ideologies for Africa from the native political systems of African peoples. Members of this movement have all been grouped under the school known as ethnophilosophy, and they thrived in the early period of African philosophy. Their concern was to build and demonstrate unique African identify in various forms. A few of them include Placid Tempels, Julius Nyerere, John Mbiti, Alexis Kagame, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah and Aime Cesaire.

b. Afro-Constructionism/Afro-Deconstructionism

The Afro-deconstructions sometimes called the Modernists or the Universalists are those who sought to demote such edifice erected by the Excavators on the grounds that their raw materials are substandard cultural paraphernalia. They are opposed to the idea of unique African identity or culture-bound philosophy and preferred a philosophy that will integrate African identity with the identity of all other races in a common universalism. They never built this philosophy. Some members of this movement include Paulin Hountondji, Kwasi Wiredu, Peter Bodunrin, Macien Towa, Fabien Ebousi Boulaga, Richard Wright and Henri Maurier. Their opponents are the Afro-constructionists, sometimes called the Traditionalists or Particularists who sought to add rigor and promote the works of the Excavators as true African philosophy. Some prominent actors in this movement include Innocent Onyewuenyi, Henry Olela, Lansana Keita, C. S. Momoh, Joseph Omoregbe, Janheinz Jahn, George James, Sophie Oluwole and, in some ways, Kwame Gyekye. Members of this twin-movement have variously been grouped under ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, professional, hermeneutical and literary schools and they thrived in the middle period of African philosophy. This is also known as the period of the great debate.

c. Critical Reconstructionism/Afro-Eclecticism

A few Afro-deconstructionists of the middle period evolved into Critical Reconstructionists hoping to reconstruct from the scratch the edifice of authentic African philosophy that would be critical, individualistic and universal. They hold that the edifice of ethnophilosophy, which they had demolished in the middle period, contained no critical rigor. Some of the members of this movement include, Kwasi Wiredu, Olusegun Oladipo, V. Y. Mudimbe, D. A. Masolo, Odera Oruka and, in some ways, Barry Hallen and J. O. Sodipo. Their opponents are the Afro-Eclectics who evolved from Afro-constructionism of the middle period. Unable to sustain their advocacy and the structure of ethnophilosophy they had constructed, they stepped down a little bit to say, “Maybe we can combine meaningfully, some of the non-conflicting concerns of the Traditionalists and the Modernists.” They say (1) that African traditional philosophy is not rigorous enough as claimed by the Modernists is a fact (2) that the deconstructionist program of the Modernists did not offer and is incapable of offering an alternative episteme is also a fact (3) maybe the rigor of the Modernists can be applied on the usable and relevant elements produced by the Traditionalists to produce the much elusive, authentic African philosophy. African philosophy for this movement therefore becomes a product of synthesis resulting from the application of tools of critical reasoning on the relevant traditions of African life-world.  A. F. Uduigwomen, Kwame  Gyekye, Ifeanyi Menkiti and Kwame Appiah are some of the members of this movement. This movement played a vital reconciliatory role, the importance of which was not fully realized in African philosophy. Most importantly, they found a way out of the dead luck produced by the Modernists and laid the foundation for the emergence of Conversationalism. Members of this twin-movement thrived in the later period of African philosophy.

d. Conversationalism

The Conversationalists are those who seek to create an enduring corpus in African philosophy by engaging elements of tradition and individual thinkers in critical conversations. They emphasize originality, creativity, innovation, peer-criticism and cross-pollination of ideas in prescribing and evaluating their ideas. They hold that new episteme in African philosophy can only be created by individual African philosophers who make use of the “usable past” and the depth of individual originality in finding solutions to contemporary demands. They do not lay emphasis on analysis alone but also on critical rigor and analytic-synthesis, where the latter consists of constructive synthesis from either tradition or individual thoughts. Members of this movement thrive in this contemporary period and their school can be called the conversational school. Some of the philosophers that have demonstrated this trait include Pantaleon Iroegbu, Innocent Asouzu, Bruce Janz, Jonathan Chimakonam, Ada Agada, Godfrey Ozumba and Jennifer Lisa Vest.

5. Periods of African Philosophy

a. Early Period

The early period of African philosophy is an era of the movement called cultural/ideological excavation aimed at retrieving and reconstructing African identity. The schools that emerged and thrived in this period were ethnophilosophy and ideological/nationalist schools. The Sub-Saharan Africans, Hegel wrote, had no high cultures and had made no contributions to world history and civilization (1975: 190). Lucien Levy Bruhl also added that they are pre-logical and two-third of human (1947: 17). The summary of these two positions, which represent the colonial mindset, is that Africans have no dignified identity like their European counterpart. This could be deciphered in the British colonial system which sought to erode the native thought system in the constitution of social systems in their colonies and also in the French policy of assimilation. Assimilation is a concept credited to the French philosopher Chris Talbot (1837) which rests on the idea of expanding French culture to the colonies outside of France in the 19th and 20th centuries. According to Betts (2005: 8), the natives of these colonies were considered French citizens as long as the French culture and customs were adopted to replace the indigenous system. The purpose of the theory of assimilation, for Michael Lambert, therefore, was to turn African natives into French men by educating them in the French language and culture (1993: 239-262).

During colonial times, the British, for example, educated their colonies in the British language and culture, strictly undermining the native languages and cultures. The products of this new social system were then given the impression that they were British, though second class, the king was their king, and the empire was also theirs. Suddenly, however, colonialism ended and they found, to their chagrin, that they were treated as slave countries in the new post-colonial order. Their native identity had been destroyed and their fake British identity had also been taken from them; what was left was amorphous and corrupt. It was in the heat of this confusion and frustration that the African philosophers sought to retrieve and recreate the original African identity lost in the event of colonization. Ruch and Anyanwu, therefore, ask, “What is this debate about African identity concerned with and what led to it? In other words, why should Africans search for their identity?” Their response to the questions is as follows:

The simple answer to these questions is this: Africans of the first half of this (20th century) century have begun to search for their identity, because they had, rightly or wrongly, the feeling that they had lost it or that they were being deprived of it. The three main factors which led to this feeling were: slavery, colonialism and racialism. (1981: 184-85)

Racialism, as Ruch and Anyanwu believed, may have sparked it off and slavery may have dealt the heaviest blow, but it was colonialism that entrenched it. Ironically, it was the same colonialism at its stylistic conclusion that opened the eyes of the African by stirring the hornet’s nest. Trouble started when the departing colonialists let the Africans know, to their humiliation, that the colonial identity they brandished was a fake one. An African can never be a British or French even with the colonially imposed language and culture. With this shock, the post colonial African philosophers of the early period set out in search of Africa’s lost identity.

Many actors in this period, like George James and Placid Tempels, were not native Africans but were touched by the insincerity and cold-heartedness of the departing colonialists. James in 1954 published his monumental work Stolen Legacy. In it, he worked to prove that the Egyptians were the true authors of Western philosophy; that Pythagoras, Socrates, Plato and Aristotle plagiarized the Egyptians; that the authorship of the individual doctrines of Greek philosophers is a mere speculation perpetuated chiefly by Aristotle and executed by his school; and that the African continent gave civilization knowledge, arts and sciences, religion and philosophy, a fact that is destined to produce a change in the mentality both of the European and African peoples. In G. M. James’ words:

In this way, the Greeks stole the legacy of the African continent and called it their own. And as has already been pointed out, the result of this dishonesty had been the creation of an enormous world opinion; that the African continent has made no contribution to civilization, because her people are backward and low in intelligence and culture…This erroneous opinion about the Black people has seriously injured them through the centuries up to modern times in which it appears to have reached a climax in the history of human relations. (1954: 54)

These rugged intellectual positions supported by evidential and well thought-out proofs quickly heralded a shift in the intellectual culture of the world. But there was one problem George James could not fix; he could not prove that the people of North Africa (Egyptians) who were the true authors of ancient art, sciences, religion and philosophy were black Africans, as can be seen in his hopeful but inconsistent conclusions:

This is going to mean a tremendous change in world opinion, and attitude, for all people and races who accept the new philosophy of Africa redemption, i.e. the truth that the Greeks were not the authors of Greek philosophy; but the people of North Africa; would change their opinion from one of disrespect to one of respect for the black people throughout the world and treat them accordingly. (1954: 153)

It is inconsistent how the achievements of North Africans (Egyptians) can redeem the black Africans. This is also the problem with Henri Olela’s article “The African Foundations of Greek Philosophy”.

In Onyewuenyi’s The African Origin of Greek Philosophy however, an ambitious attempt emerges to fill this lacuna in the argument of new philosophy of African redemption. In the first part of chapter two, he reduced the Greek philosophy to Egyptian philosophy, and in the second part, he attempted to further reduce the Egyptians of the time to black Africans. There are, however, two holes he could not fill. First, Egypt is the world’s oldest standing country who also told their own story by themselves in different forms. At no point did they or other historians describe them as black people. Second, if the Egyptians were at a time wholly black, why are they now wholly white? For the failure of this group of scholars to prove that black Africans were the authors of Egyptian philosophy, one must abandon the Egyptian legacy.

There are however other scholars of the early period who tried in more reliable ways to assert black identity by establishing native African philosophical heritage. One of such is Tempels who authored Bantu Philosophy (1949). He proved that rationality was an important feature of the traditional African culture. By systematizing Bantu philosophical ideas he confronted the racist orientation of the West which depicted Africa as a continent of semi-humans. In fact, Tempels showed the latent similarities in the spiritual inclinations of the Europeans and their African counterpart. In the opening passage of his work he observed that the European who has taken to atheism quickly returns to a Christian viewpoint when suffering or pain threatens his survival. In much the same way, he says the civilized or Christian Bantu returns to the ways of his ancestors when confronted by suffering and death. So, spiritual orientation or thinking is not found only in Africa.

In his attempt to explain the Bantu understanding of being, Tempels admits that this might not be the same with the understanding of the European. Instead, he argues that the Bantu construction is as much rational as that of the European. In his words:

So the criteriology of the Bantu rests upon external evidence, upon the authority and dominating life force of the ancestors. It rests at the same time upon the internal evidence of experience of nature and of living phenomena, observed from their point of view. No doubt, anyone can show the error of their reasoning; but it must none the less be admitted that their notions are based on reason, that their criteriology and their wisdom belong to rational knowledge. (1949/2006: 51)

 Tempels obviously believes that the Bantu, like the rest of the African tribes, posses rationality which undergird their philosophical enterprise. The error in their reasoning is only obvious in the light of European logic. The Bantu categories only differ from those of the Europeans, which is why a first-time European on-looker would misinterpret them to be irrational or spiritual. This effort clearly makes a case for Africa’s true identity, which, for him, could be found in African religion within which African philosophy (ontology) is subsumed. In his words, “being is force, force is being”. And the same could be said of Alexis Kagame’s work The Bantu-Rwandan Philosophy (1956), which offers similar proofs and arguments thus further strengthening the claims of Tempels, especially from an African’s perspective. The major criticism against their industry remains the association of their thoughts with ethnophilosophy, where ethnophilosophy is seen perjoratively. A much more studded criticism is offered recently by Innocent Asouzu in his work Ibuanyidanda: New Complementary Ontology (2007). His criticism was not directed at the validity of the thoughts they expressed or whether Africa could boast of a rational enterprise such as philosophy but at the logical foundation of their thoughts. Asouzu seems to quarrel with Tempels for allowing his native Aristotelian orientation to influence his construction of African philosophy and lambasts Kagame for following suit instead of correcting Tempels’ mistake. The principle of bivalence as evidenced in the Western thought system was at the background of their construction.

Another important philosopher in this period is John Mbiti. His work African Religions and Philosophy (1969) avidly educated those who doubted Africans’ possession of their own identities before the arrival of the European by excavating and demonstrating the rationality in the religious and philosophical enterprises in African cultures. He boldly declared: “We shall use the singular, ‘philosophy’ to refer to the philosophical understanding of African peoples concerning different issues of life” (1969: 2). His presentation of time in African thought shows off the pattern of excavation in his African philosophy. Although his studies focus primarily on the Kikamba and Gikuyu tribes of Africa, he observes that there are similarities in many African cultures just as Tempels did earlier.  He subsumes African philosophy in African religion on the assumption that African peoples do not know how to exist without religion. This idea is also shared by William Abraham in his book The Mind of Africa as well as Tempels’ Bantu Philosophy. African philosophy, from Mbiti’s treatment, could be likened to Tempels’ vital force, of which African religion is its outer cloak. The obvious focus of this book is on African views about God, political thought, afterlife, culture or world-view and creation, the philosophical aspects lie within these religious over-coats. Thus, Mbiti establishes that the true, and lost, identity of the African could be found within his religion. Another important observation Mbiti made is that this identity is communal and not individualistic. Hence, he states, “I am because we are and since we are therefore I am” (1969: 108). Therefore, the African has to re-enter his religion to find his philosophy and the community to find his identity.

This is a view shared by William Abraham in his The Mind of Africa (1962). He shares Tempels and Mbiti’s views that the black African tribes have many similarities in their culture, though his studies focus on the culture and political thought of the Akan of present day Ghana. Another important aspect of Abraham’s work is that he subsumed African philosophical thought in African culture taking, as Barry Hallen described, “an essentialist interpretation of African culture” (2002: 15). Thus for Abraham, like Tempels and Mbiti, the lost African identity could be found in the seabed of African indigenous culture in which religion features prominently.

On the other hand, there were those who sought to retrieve and establish once again Africa’s lost identity through economic and political ways. Some names discussed here include Kwame Nkrumah, Leopold Senghor and Julius Nyerere. These actors felt that the African could never be truly decolonized unless he found his own system of living and social organization. One cannot be African living like the European. The question that guided their study therefore became, “What system of economic and social engineering will suit us and project our true identity?” Nkrumah advocates African socialism, which, according to Barry Hallen, is an original, social, political and philosophical theory of African origin and orientation. This system is forged from the traditional, communal structure of African society, a view strongly projected by Mbiti. Nkrumah says that a return to African cultural system with its astute moral values, communal ownership of land and a humanitarian social and political engineering holds the key to Africa rediscovering her lost identity. Systematizing this process, will yield what he calls the African brand of socialism. In most of his books, he projects the idea that Africa’s lost identity is to be found in African native culture within which is African philosophical thought and identity shaped by communal orientation. Some of his works include, Neo-colonialism: The Last Stage of Imperialism (1965), I Speak of Freedom: A Statement of African Ideology (1961), Africa Must Unite (1970), and Consciencism (1954).

Leopold Sedar Senghor of Senegal charted a course similar to that of Nkrumah. In his works Negritude et Humanisme (1964) and Negritude and the Germans (1967), Senghor traced Africa’s philosophy of social engineering down to African culture, which he said is communal and laden with brotherly emotion. This is different from the European system, which he says is individualistic, having been marshaled purely by reason. He opposed the French colonial principle of assimilation aimed at turning Africans into Frenchmen by eroding and replacing African culture with French culture. African culture and languages are the bastions of African identity, and it is in this culture that he found the pedestal for constructing a political ideology that would project African lost identity. Senghor is in agreement with Nkrumah, Mbiti, Abraham and Tempels in many ways, especially with regards to the basis for Africa’s true identity.

Julius Nyerere of Tanzania is another philosopher of note in the early period of African philosophy. In his books Uhuru na Ujamaa: Freedom and Socialism (1964) and Ujamaa: The Basis of African Socialism (1968), he sought to retrieve and establish African true identity through economic and political ways. For him, Africans cannot regain their identity unless they are first free and freedom (Uhuru) transcends independence. Cultural imperialism has to be overcome. And what is the best way to achieve this if not by developing a socio-political and economic ideology from the petals of African native culture, and traditional values of togetherness and brotherliness? Hence, Nyerere proposes Ujamaa, meaning familyhood—the “being-with” philosophy or the “we” instead of the “I—spirit” (Okoro 2004: 96). In the words of Barry Hallen, “Nyerere argued that there was a form of life and system of values indigenous to the culture of pre-colonial Africa, Tanzania in particular, that was distinctive if not unique and that had survived the onslaughts of colonialism sufficiently intact to be regenerated as the basis for an African polity” (2002: 74). Thus for Nyerere, the basis of African identity is the African culture, which is communal rather than individualistic. Nyerere was in agreement with other actors of this period on the path to full recovery of Africa’s lost identity. Other philosophers of this era not treated here include Nnamdi Azikiwe, Obafemi Awolowo, Amilcar Cabral, and the two foreigners, Janheinz Jahn and Marcel Griaule.

b. Middle Period

The middle period of African philosophy is also an era of the twin-movement called Afro-constructionism and afro-deconstructionism, otherwise called the great debate, when two rival schools—Traditionalists and Universalists clashed. While the Traditionalists sought to construct an African identity based on excavated African cultural elements, the Universalists sought to demolish such architectonic structure by associating it with ethnophilosophy. The schools that thrived in this era include Philosophic Sagacity, Professional/Modernist/Universalist, Afro-hermeneutical and Literary schools.

An important factor of the early period is that the thoughts on the basis for Africa’s true identity generated arguments that fostered the emergence of the Middle Period of African philosophy. These arguments result from questions that could be summarized as follows: (1) Is it proper to take for granted the sweeping assertion that all of Africa’s cultures share a few basic elements in common? It was this assumption that had necessitated the favorite phrase in the early period, “African philosophy,” rather than “African philosophies”. (2) Does Africa or African culture contain a philosophy in the strict sense of the term? (3) Can African philosophy emerge from the womb of African religion, world-view and culture? Answers and objections to answers soon took the shape of a debate, characterizing the middle period as the era of the great debate in African philosophy.

This debate was between members of Africa’s new crop of intellectual radicals. On one hand, are the demoters and, on the other, are the promoters of African philosophy established by the league of early period intellectuals. The former sought to criticize this new philosophy of redemption, gave it a derogatory tag “ethnophilosophy” and consequently denigrated the African Identity that was founded on it as savage and primitive identity. At the other end, the promoters sought to clarify and defend this philosophy and justify the African identity that was rooted in it as true and original.

For clarity, the assessment of the debate era will begin from the middle instead of the beginning. In 1978 Odera Oruka a Kenyan philosopher presented a paper at the William Amo Symposium held in Accra, Ghana on the topic “Four Trends in Current African Philosophy” in which he identified or grouped voices on African philosophy into four schools, namely ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, nationalistic-ideological school and professional philosophy. In 1990 he wrote another work, Sage Philosophy: Indigenous Thinker and the Modern Debate on African Philosophy in which he further added two schools to bring the number to six schools in African philosophy. Those two additions are the hermeneutic and artistic/literary schools.

Those who uphold philosophy in African culture are the ethnophilosophers and these include the actors treated as members of the early period of African philosophy and their followers or supporters in the Middle Period. These would include C. S. Momoh, Joseph Omoregbe, Lansana Keita, Olusegun Oladipo, Gordon Hunnings, Kwame Gyekye, M. A. Makinde, Emmanuel Edeh, Uzodinma Nwala, K. C. Anyanwu and later E. A. Ruch, to name a few. The philosophic sagacity school, to which Oruka belongs, also accommodates C. S. Momoh, C. B. Nze, J. I. Omoregbe, C. B. Okolo and T. F. Mason. The nationalist-ideological school consists of those who sought to develop indigenous socio-political and economic ideologies for Africa. Prominent members include Julius Nyerere, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah, Amilcar Cabral, Nnamdi Azikiwe and Obafemi Awolowo. The professional philosophy school insists that African philosophy must be done with professional philosophical methods such as analysis, critical reflection and logical coherence as it is in Western philosophy. Members of this school include: Henri Maurier, Richard Wright, Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, early E. A. Ruch, R. Horton, and later C. B. Okolo. The hermeneutic school recommends linguistic analysis as a method of doing African philosophy. A few of its members include Theophilus Okere, Okonda Okolo, Godwin Sogolo and partly J. Sodipo and B. Hallen. The Artistic/Literary school philosophically discusses the core of African norms,  and includes Chinua Achebe, Okot P’Bitek, Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Wole Soyinka, Elechi Amadi and F. C. Ogbalu.

Also, in 1989, C. S. Momoh in his The Substance of African Philosophy outlined five schools, namely African logical neo-positivism, the colonial/missionary school of thought, the Egyptological school, the ideological school and the purist school. The article was titled “Nature, Issues and Substance of African Philosophy” and was reproduced in Jim Unah’s Metaphysics, Phenomenology and African Philosophy (1996).

In comparing Momoh’s delineations with Oruka’s, it can be said that the purist school encompasses Oruka’s ethnophilosophy, artistic/literary school and philosophic sagacity; The African logical neo-positivism encompasses  professional philosophy and the hermeneutical schools; and the ideological and colonial/missionary schools correspond to Oruka’s nationalistic-ideological school. The Egyptological school, therefore, remains outstanding. Momoh sees it as a school which sees African philosophy as synonymous with Egyptian philosophy or at least as originating from it. Also, Egyptian philosophy as a product of African philosophy is also expressed in the writings of I. C. Onyewuenyi and Henry Olela.

Welding all these divisions together are the perspectives of Peter Bodunrin and Kwasi Wiredu. In the introduction to his 1985 edited volume Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Bodunrin created two broad schools for all the subdivisions in both Oruka and Momoh, namely the Traditionalist and Modernist schools. While the former includes Africa’s rich culture and past, the latter excludes them from the mainstream of African philosophy. Kwasi Wiredu also made this type of division, specifically Traditional and Modernist, in his paper “On Defining African Philosophy” in C. S. Momoh’s (1989) edited volume. Also, A. F. Uduigwomen created two broad schools, namely the Universalists and the Particularists, in his “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy” (1995). These can be equated to Bodunrin’s Modernist and Traditionalist schools respectively. The significance of his contribution to the great debate rests on the new school he evolved from the compromise of the Universalist and the Particularist schools (1995/2009: 2-7). As Uduigwomen defines it, the Eclectic school accommodates discourses pertaining to African experiences, culture and world-view as parts of African philosophy. Those discourses must be critical, argumentative and rational. In other words, the so-called ethnophilosophy can comply with the analytic and argumentative standards that people like Bodunrin, Hountondji, and Wiredu insist upon. Many later African philosophers revived Uduigwomen’s Eclectic school as a much more decisive approach to African philosophy (Kanu 2013: 275-87). It is the era dominated by Eclecticism and meta-philosophy that is tagged the ‘Later period’ in the history of African philosophy. For perspicuity therefore, the debate from these two broad schools shall be addressed as the perspectives of the Traditionalist or Particularist and the Modernist or Universalist.

The reader must now have understood the perspectives on which the individual philosophers of the middle period debated. Hence, when Richard Wright published his critical essay “Investigating African Philosophy” and Henri Maurier published his “Do we have an African Philosophy?” denying the existence of African philosophy at least as yet, the reader understands why Lansana Keita’s “The African Philosophical Tradition”, C. S. Momoh’s African Philosophy … does it exist?” or J. I. Omoregbe’s “African Philosophy Yesterday and Today” are offered as critical responses. When Wright arrived at the conclusion that the problems surrounding the study of African philosophy are so great that others are effectively prevented from any worthwhile work until their resolution, Henri Maurier responded  to the question, “Do we have an African Philosophy?” with “No! Not Yet!” (1984: 25). One would understand why Lansana Keita took it up to provide concrete evidence that Africa had and still has a philosophical tradition. In his words:

It is the purpose of this paper to present evidence that a sufficiently firm literate philosophical tradition has existed in Africa since ancient times, and that this tradition is of sufficient intellectual sophistication to warrant serious analysis…it is rather…an attempt to offer a defensible idea of African philosophy. (1984: 58)

Keita went on in that paper to excavate intellectual resources to prove his case, but it was J. I. Omoregbe who tackled the demoters on every front. Of particular interest are his critical commentaries on the position of Kwasi Wiredu and others who share Wiredu’s opinion that what is called African philosophy is not philosophy but community thought at best. Omoregbe alludes that the logic and method of African philosophy need not be the same as those of Western philosophy, which the demoters cling to.  In his words:

It is not necessary to employ Aristotelian or the Russellian logic in this reflective activity before one can be deemed to be philosophizing. It is not necessary to carry out this reflective activity in the same way that the Western thinkers did. Ability to reason logically and coherently is an integral part of man’s rationality. The power of logical thinking is identical with the power of rationality. It is therefore false to say that people cannot think logically or reason coherently unless they employ Aristotle’s or Russell’s form of logic or even the Western-type argumentation. (1998: 4-5)

Omoregbe was addressing the position of most members of the Modernist school who believed that African philosophy must follow the pattern of Western philosophy if it were to exist. As he cautions:

Some people, trained in Western philosophy and its method, assert that there is no philosophy and no philosophizing outside the Western type of philosophy or the Western method of philosophizing (which they call “scientific” or “technical”. (1998: 5)

Philosophers like E. A. Ruch in some of his earlier writings,, Peter Bodunrin, C. B. Okolo, and Robin Horton were direct recipients of Omoregbe’s sledge hammer. Robin Horton’s “African Traditional Thought and Western Science” is a two part essay that sought in the long run to expose the rational ineptitude in African thought. On the question of logic in African philosophy, Robin Horton’s “Traditional Thought and the emerging African Philosophy Department: A Comment on the Current Debate” first stirred the hornet’s nest and was ably challenged by Godorn Hunnings’ “Logic, Language and Culture”, as well as by Omoregbe’s “African Philosophy: Yesterday and Today”. Earlier, Meinrad Hebga’s “Logic in Africa” had made insightful ground clearing on the matter. Recently, C.S. Momoh’s “The Logic Question in African Philosophy” and Udo Etuk’s “The Possibility of an African Logic” as well as Jonathan C. Okeke’s “Why can’t there be an African Logic” made impressions. However, this logic question is gathering new momentum in African philosophical discourse.

On the philosophical angle, Kwasi Wiredu’s “How not to Compare African Traditional Thought with Western Thought” responded to the lopsided earlier effort of Robin Horton but ended up making its own criticisms of the status of African philosophy which, for Wiredu, is yet to attain maturation. In his words, “[M]any traditional African institutions and cultural practices, such as the ones just mentioned, are based on superstition. By ‘superstition’ I mean a rationally unsupported belief in entities of any sort (1976: 4-8 and 1995: 194).” In his Philosophy and an African Culture, Wiredu was more pungent. He caricatured much of the discourse on African philosophy as community thought or folk thought unqualified to be called philosophy. For him, there had to be a practiced distinction between “African philosophy as folk thought preserved in oral traditions and African philosophy as critical, individual reflection, using modern logical and conceptual techniques” (1980: 14). Olusegun Oladipo supports this in his Philosophy and the African Experience. As he puts it:

But this kind of attitude is mistaken. In Africa we are engaged in the task of the improvement of “the condition of men”. There can be no successful execution of this task without a reasonable knowledge of, and control over, nature. But essential to the quest for knowledge of, and control over, nature are “logical, mathematical and analytical procedures” which are products of modern intellectual practices. The glorification of the “unanalytical cast of mind” which a conception of African philosophy as African folk thought encourages would not avail us the opportunity of taking advantage of the theoretical and practical benefits offered by these intellectual procedures. It thus can only succeed in making the task of improving the condition of man in Africa a daunting one.(1996: 15)

Oladipo also shares similar thoughts in his The Idea of African Philosophy. African philosophy for some of the Modernists is practiced in a debased sense. This position is considered opinionated by the Traditionalists. Later E. A. Ruch and K. C. Anyanwu in their African Philosophy: An Introduction to the Main Philosophical Trends in Contemporary Africa attempt to excavate the philosophical elements in folklore and myth. C. S. Momoh’s “The Mythological Question in African Philosophy” and K. C. Anyanwu’s “Philosophical Significance of Myth and Symbol in Dogon World-View” further reinforced the position of the Traditionalists.(cf. Momoh 1989 and Anyanwu 1989)

However, it took Paulin Hountondji in his African Philosophy: Myth and Reality to drive a long nail in the coffin. African philosophy, for him, must be done in the same frame as Western philosophy, including its principles, methodologies, methods and all. K. C. Anyanwu again admitted that Western philosophy is one of the challenges facing African philosophy but that only calls for systematization of African philosophy not its decimation. He made these arguments in his paper “The Problem of Method in African philosophy”.

Other arguments set Greek standards for authentic African philosophy as can be found in Odera Oruka’s “The Fundamental Principles in the Question of ‘African Philosophy’ (I)” and Hountondji’s “African Wisdom and Modern Philosophy.” They readily met with Lansana Keita’s “African Philosophical Systems: A Rational Reconstruction”, J. Kinyongo’s “Philosophy in Africa: An Existence” and even P. K. Roy’s “African Theory of Knowledge”. For every step the Modernists took, the Traditionalists replied with two, a response that lingered till the early 1990’s when a certain phase of disillusionment began to set in to quell the debate. Actors on both fronts had only then begun to reach a new consciousness, realizing that a new step had to be taken beyond the debate. Even Kwasi Wiredu who had earlier justified the debate by his insistence that “without argument and clarification, there is strictly no philosophy” (1980: 47) had to admit that it was time to do something else. For him, African philosophers had to go beyond talking about African philosophy and get down to actually doing it.

It was with this sort of new orientation which emerged from the disillusionment of the protracted debate that the later period of African philosophy was born in the 1990’s. As it is said in the Igbo proverb, “The music makers almost unanimously were changing the rhythm and the dancers had to change their dance steps.”  One of the high points of the disillusionment was the emergence of the Eclectic school in the next period called ‘the Later Period’ of African philosophy.

c. Later Period

This period of African philosophy heralds the emergence of the movements which can be called Critical Reconstructionism and Afro-Eclecticism. For the Deconstructionists of the middle period, the focus shifted from deconstruction to reconstruction of African episteme in a universally integrated way; whereas, for the eclectics, finding a reconcilable middle path between traditional African philosophy and the universal African philosophy should be paramount. Thus they advocate a shift from entrenched ethnophilosophy and universal hue to the reconstruction of African episteme if somewhat different from the imposed Westernism and the uncritical ethnophilosophy. So, both the Critical Reconstructionists and the Eclectics advocate one form of reconstruction or the other. The former desire a new episteme untainted by ethnophilosophy while the later sue for reconciled central and relevant ideals.

Not knowing how to proceed to this sort of task was a telling problem on all advocates of critical reconstruction in African philosophy such as V. Y. Mudimbe, Ebousi Boulaga, Olusegun Oladipo, Franz Crahey and Marcien Towa to name a few. At the dawn of the era, these African legionnaires pointed out, in different terms, that reconstructing African episteme was imperative. But more urgent was the need to first analyse the haggard philosophical structure patched into existence with the cement of perverse dialogues. It appeared inexorable to these thinkers and others of the time that none of these can be successful outside the shadow of Westernism. For whatever one writes which is effectively free from ethnophilosophy is either contained in Western discourse or in the very least proceeds from its logic. If it is already contained in Western narrative or proceeds from its logic, what then makes it African? This became a something of a dead-end for this illustrious group, which struggled against evolutions in their positions.

Intuitively, almost every analyst knows that discussing what has been discussed in Western philosophy or taking a lead from Western philosophy does not absolutely negate or vitiate what is produced as African philosophy. But how is this to be effectively justified? This appears to be the Achilles heel of the Critical Reconstructionists of the late era in African philosophy. The massive failure of these Critical Reconstructionists to go beyond the lines of recommendation and actually engage in reconstructing delayed their emergence as a school of thought in African philosophy. The diversionary matrix which occurred at this point ensured that the later period, which began the two rival camps ofCritical Reconstructionists and Eclectics, ended with only the Eclectics left standing. Thus dying in its embryo, Critical Reconstructionism became absorbed in Eclecticism.

The campaign for Afro-reconstructionism had first emerged in the late 1980‘s in the writings of Peter Bodunrin, Olusegun Oladipo, Kwasi Wiredu and V. Y. Mudimbe, even though principals like Marcien Towa and Franz Crahey had hinted at it much earlier. The insights of the latter two never rang bells beyond the ear-shot of identity reconstruction, which was the echo of their time. Wiredu’s cry for conceptual decolonization and Hountondji’s call for the abandonment of the ship of ethnophilosophy were in the spirit of Afro-reconstructionism of the episteme. None of the Afro-reconstructionists except for Wiredu was able to truly chart a course for reconstruction. His was linguistic even though the significance of his campaign was never truly appreciated. His 1998 work “Toward Decolonizing African Philosophy and Religion,” was a clearer recapitulation of his works of preceding years.

Beyond this modest line, no other reconstructionist crusader of the time actually went beyond deconstruction and problem identification. Almost spontaneously, Afro-reconstructionism evolved into Afro-eclecticism in the early 1990’s when the emerging Critical Reconstructionism ran into a brick wall of inactivity. The argument seems to say, “If it is not philosophically permissible to employ alternative logic different from the one in the West or methods, perhaps we can make do with the merger of the approaches we have identified in African philosophy following the deconstructions.” These approaches are the various schools of thought from ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, ideological school, universal, literary to Afro-hermeneutic schools which were deconstructed into two broad approaches namely: The traditionalist school and the modernist school also called the particularist and the universalist schools.

Eclectics, therefore, are those who think that the effective integration or complementation of the African native system and the Western system could produce a viable synthesis that is first African and then modern. Andrew Uduigwomen, the Nigerian philosopher could be regarded as the founder of this school in African philosophy. In his 1995 work “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy,” he gave official birth to the Afro-eclecticism. Identifying the Traditionalist and Modernist schools as the Particularist and Universalist schools, he created the eclectic school by carefully unifying their goals from the ruins of the deconstructed past.

Uduigwomen states that the eclectic school holds that an intellectual romance between the Universalist conception and the Particularist conception will give rise to an authentic African philosophy. The Universalist approach will provide the necessary analytic and conceptual framework for the Particularist school. Since, according to Uduigwomen, this framework cannot thrive in a vacuum, the Particularist approach will in turn supply the raw materials or indigenous data needed by the Universalist approach. From the submission of Uduigwomen above, one easily detects that Eclecticism for him entails employing Western methods or African paraphernalia.

However, Afro-Eclecticism is not without problems. The first problem though, is that he did not supply the yardstick for determining what is to be admitted and what must be left out of the corpus of African tradition. Everything cannot meet the standard of genuine philosophy, nor should the philosophical selection be arbitrary. Hountondji, a chronic critic of traditional efforts once called Tempels’ Bantu philosophy a sham. For him, it was not African or Bantu philosophy but Tempels’ philosophy with African paraphernalia. This could be extended to the vision of Afro-eclecticism. On the contrary, it could be argued that if Hountondji agrees that the synthesis contains as little as African paraphernalia, then it is something new and in this respect can claim the tag of African philosophy. However, it leaves to be proven how philosophical that little African paraphernalia is.

Other notable eclectics include Batholomew Abanuka, Udobata Onunwa, C. C. Ekwealor and much later Chris Ijiomah. Abanuka posits in his 1994 work that a veritable way to doing authentic African philosophy would be to recognize the unity of individual things and, by extension, theories in ontology, epistemology or ethics. There is a basic identity among these because they are connected and can be unified. Following C. S. Momoh (1985: 12), Abanuka went on in A History of African Philosophy to argue that synthesis should be the ultimate approach to doing African Philosophy. This position is shared by Onunwa on a micro level. He says that realities in African world-view are inter-connected and inter-dependent (1991: 66-71). Ekwealor and Ijiomah also believe in synthesis, noting that these realities are broadly dualistic, being physical and spiritual (cf. Ekwalor 1990: 30 and Ijiomah 2005: 76 and 84). So, it would be an anomaly to think of African philosophy as chiefly an exercise in analysis rather than synthesis. The ultimate methodological approach to doing African philosophy, therefore, has to reflect unity of methods above all else.

Eclecticism survived in the New Era of African philosophy in conversational forms. Godfrey Ozumba and Jonathan Chimakonam on Njikoka philosophy, E. G. Ekwuru and later Innocent Egwutuorah on Afrizealotism and even Innocent Asouzu on Ibuanyidanda ontology are all various forms of eclectic thinking. However, these theories are grouped in the New Era specifically for the time of their emergence and the conversational structure they have.

The purest development of eclectic thinking in the later period could be found in Pantaleon Iroegbu’s Uwa Ontology. He posits uwa (worlds) as an abstract generic concept with fifteen connotations and six zones. Everything is uwa, in uwa and can be known through uwa. For him, while the fifteen connotations are the different senses and aspects which uwa concept carries in Igbo-African thought, the six zones are the spatio-temporal locations of the worlds in terms of their inhabitants. He adds that these six zones are dualistic and comprise of the earthly and the spiritual. They are also dynamic and mutually relate. Thus, Iroegbu suggests that the approach to doing authentic African philosophy could consist in the conglomeration of uwa. This demonstrates a veritable Eclectic method in African philosophy.

However, one of the major hindrances of Eclecticism of the later period is that it leads straight to applied philosophy. Following this approach in this period almost makes it impossible for second readers to do original and abstract philosophizing for its own sake. Eclectic theories and methods confine one to their internal dynamics believing that for a work to be regarded as authentic African philosophy, it must follow the rules of Eclecticism. The wider implication is that while creativity might blossom, innovation and originality are stifled. Because of pertinent problems such as these, further evolutions in African philosophy became inevitable. The Kenyan philosopher Odera Oruka had magnified the thoughts concerning individual rather than group philosophizing, thoughts that had been variously expressed earlier by Peter Bodunrin, Paulin Hountondji and Kwasi Wiredu, who further admonished African philosophers to stop talking and start doing African philosophy. And V. Y. Mudimbe, in his The Invention of Africa…, suggested the development of an African conversational philosophy, and the reinvention of Africa by its philosophers, to undermine the Africa that Europe invented. The content of Lewis Gordon’s essay “African Philosophy’s search for Identity: Existential consideration of a recent effort” suggests a craving for a new line of development for African philosophy—a new approach which is to be critical, analytical and universal while still being African. This, in particular, is the spirit of the conversational African philosophy beginning to grip African philosophers in late 1990’s when Gordon wrote his paper. Influences from these thoughts by the turn of the millennium year crystallized into a new mode of thinking, which then metamorphosed into conversational philosophy. The New Era in African philosophy was thus heralded. The focus of this New Era and the orientation became the conversational philosophy.

d. New Era

This period of African philosophy began in the late 1990’s and took shape by the turn of the millennium years. The orientation of this period is conversational philosophy, so, conversationalism is the movement that thrives in this era. In the Calabar School of Philosophy, three prominent schools of thought emerged, namely Interrogatory Theory, Ibuanyidanda and Njikoka philosophies. Conversational philosophy is defined by the active engagement of individual African philosophers in the creation of critical narratives either by engaging the elements of tradition or straight-forwardly by producing new thoughts or by engaging other individual thinkers. So there is critical analysis, critical synthesis, theoretical evaluation, re-enforcements and purifications of the thoughts of other African philosophers in ways that upgrade them to metanarrative of African philosophy. These also make such thoughts universal although with the primary purpose of solving African problems. In this era, the synthesis of the later period evolves into critical synthesis and the degraded critical analysis returns in full force.

Some of the noisy proponents of conversational African philosophy in this era ironically have emerged in the Western world, notably in America. The American philosopher Jennifer Lisa Vest is noted principally for this campaign. Another champion is the brilliant Bruce Janz, ironically, a white American philosopher. He too, is an ardent scholar in African philosophy. These two, to name a few, posit that the highest purification of African philosophy is to be realized in conversational philosophizing.

However, it was the Nigerian philosopher Innocent Asouzu who went beyond the earlier botched attempt of Leopold Senghor and transcended the foundations of Pantaleon Iroegbu to erect a new model of African philosophy. The New Era, therefore, is the beginning of that African philosophy, and Innocent Asouzu, according to the young Nigerian philosopher Ada Agada, arguably could be regarded as the father of it. It is believed that he beat his compatriot, the imaginative Pantaleon Iroegbu, whose career was cut short by death, to this honor. Ada Agada believes Asouzu also beat the illustrious Ghanaian philosopher Kwasi Wiredu to this honor simply by the dense, constructionist flavor of his works.. The importance of Wiredu in African philosophy cannot be fully captured in an expression,thought the most prolific says,  “One can add that without a Wiredu there may never have been an Asouzu in African philosophy.” Yet, there is a touch in Asouzu’s works that make him stand out. Wiredu may therefore be properly regarded as a forerunner.  Wiredu may be regarded as the John de Baptiste of African philosophy, in that he identified problems and suggested ways of constructing a more modern African philosophy for decades. He was preparing the mind of Africa for the arrival of a new African philosophy. In the same light, Ngugi wa Thiong’o (cf. 1986) spoke of decolonizing the African mind while Amilcar Cabral (cf. 1969), the Guinean nationalist, recommended what he called “return to the source,” a sort of re-africanization of the colonized people of Africa through philosophical re-education. This re-education is necessary for the recovery and re-integration of Africans brainwashed through the colonial education or, as some have said, mis-education to borrow the favored concept of Ivan Illich in his Deschooling the Society. The colonial mis-education, which is said to have consisted in the transfer of foreign system of thought and the denigration of the indigenous one, eventually created out of the so-called Africans what Tempels Placid, in Bantu Philosophy, calls évoléus, or the deracinés (1949/2006: 13).  These are those Africans who have been torn away from the traditional ways of life and the thoughts of their own ethnic group. They have taken on those of the West, which they have been made to believe represent civilization.

However, to do a new African philosophy is as important as to prepare for it. This is the ultimate focus of Wiredu’s campaign. Wiredu’s style of cry and hue was adopted extensively by some who became his latter contemporaries, namely V. Y. Mudimbe, who spoke of the post-colonial Africa that was invented by the West and which needs to be re-invented for authentic African philosophy to take root in his book, The Invention of African. D. A. Masolo, the Kenyan philosopher, also followed in these footsteps in his book African Philosophy in search of Identity. For him, the true African identity was corrupted and compromised by colonialism, and it was the task of African thinkers to reconstruct the true African identity from which the authentic African philosophy will grow out of particular cultural condition and pursue varied constructions of African reality, problems and methods of acquiring relevant and new knowledge.

Paulin Hountondji was another thinker to be influenced by Wiredu’s line of thought. A Benin philosopher, it seems from the extreme tone of his works that he is an unrepentant évoléus. He sees nothing good in ethnophilosophy, a term he has been incorrectly credited for coining in order to correlate it with all previous attempts to articulate African philosophy from the traditional orientation (cf. Bodunrin 1984: ft.3, 21). The difference between him and Wiredu is that he seems to advocate the assimilation and retention of the colonial system of thought. He radicalizes Wiredu’s campaign of rigor for African philosophy by outright denigration of an African system of thought. Such uniqueness he assumes is debased and crystallizes in what he calls the “myth of unanimism” (1996: 61). The undoing of his argument is the implication of his thought that to be capable of philosophizing at all, Africans must adopt the colonial system of thought. This separates him from the pack of Wiredu-loyalists. As celebrated as his works have been, they are no less controversial. For one, some think his African Philosophy: Myth and Reality is a bad mark in African philosophy. The premise of his argument is faulty from the start. The idea of African traditions and indigenous systems of thought polluting the philosophy Africans seek to construct and reduce it to ethnophilosophy is faulty. Also, the suggestion that constructing a philosophical tradition that would engender African thought systems is tantamount to constructing a debased philosophy is misleading. It is the approach, not the paraphernalia of African culture that makes a thought fall under ethnophilosophy. Despite Hountondji’s elaborate admission, the African indigenous system of thought is not inferior to that of Europe The philosophy it will yield would be unique. Two sets of questions that might startle and expose the weak-ends in Hountondji’s advocacy are:

  1. If an African indigenous thought system makes Africans and their philosophy inferior to those of the colonialist, can the assimilation of Western thought system make Africans and the philosophy they would construct through it equal to the colonialists? And could such Africans and their philosophy be truly called African with Western background thought system?
  2. When Africans leave off everything that makes them African (traditions, culture, thought system, etc.,) and adopt those of the West in a cheap search for belongingness, do they become Westerners by default? Would they still remain Africans? Or do they now become évolués? Is being unique actually the same as being inferior? And is being like the West actually the same as being non-inferior?

Hountondji’s failure to understand these lines of difference led him to what is perhaps the greatest philosophical misinformation in any liberation struggle. By way of analogy, Hountondji is asking Africans to abandon their thatch house, move across the street and seek admission into the colonialist mansion where they will sleep in the garden working as gardeners. This, he says, would make Africans equal to the European, the Lord of the Mansion. Perhaps, it is the feeling of having left the thatch house and being within the walls of the colonialist mansion that can delude such an African into thinking that he is now on par with the owner of the mansion. Hountondji forgets in his excitement that the owner of the mansion, to which the African is a gardener, does not and cannot share this sentiment. You cannot beat a man in his home; every such mansion has but one master.

The mansion of Western philosophy was not built in a day and was once like the African thatch house. When readers see the speculations of Homer, Hesiod and even the Ionian philosophers they wink in amusement. Plato’s eugenics for examples, the position of the Cynics and Aristotle’s grave ignorance with regards to slaves and women, represent the thatch house of European philosophy. For Hountondji to advise Africans to abandon their thatch house instead of seeking ways to turn it into a befitting mansion is the height of philosophical indolence. The confirmation of this indolence is that Hountondji, living within the Eldorado world of the colonialist philosophical mansion, has not been able to construct any theory to exemplify the structure he proposes for African philosophy. So where is the paradise he promises? It does seem better therefore, to remain in the thatch house and rebuild it into a mansion like Neurath’s Mariner, which was rebuilt plank by plank whilst Neurath was on board the ship, than to abandon what is truly African to become a gardener in another man’s mansion. Most African évolués, it is safe to declare, who have written or are writing on the subject of philosophy are nothing but commentators on Western philosophy.

The orientation of crying the hue and sermon-crusading of Kwasi Wiredu was replaced by Pantaleon Iroegbu’s theoretic framing. He began the actual doing of African philosophy in accordance with the recommendations of Wiredu and his apostles such as Olusegun Oladipo, Peter Bodunrin, Lansana Keita, V. Y. Mudimbe, D. A. Masolo to name a few. Theophilus Okere and the Congolese philosopher Okonda Okolo, Marcien Towa as well as Wamba Dia Wamba in some fashion can also be brought under this category.

Iroegbu in his Metaphysics: The Kpim of Philosophy inaugurated the reconstructive and conversational approach in African philosophy. He engaged previous writers in a critical conversation out of which he produced his own thought, (Uwa ontology) bearing the stain of African tradition and thought systems but remarkably different in approach and method of ethnophilosophy. Franz Fanon has highlighted the importance of sourcing African philosophical paraphernalia from African indigenous culture. This is corroborated in a way by Lucius Outlaw in his African Philosophy: Deconstructive and Reconstructive Challenges. In it, Outlaw advocates the deconstruction of the European-invented Africa to be replaced by a reconstruction to be done by conscientious Africans free from the grip of colonial mentality (1996: 11). Whereas the Wiredu’s crusade sought to deconstruct the invented Africa, actors in the New Era of African philosophy seek to reconstruct through conversational approach. The conversational approach is a method of critical engagement of tradition or the individual thinkers that aims at criticisms, reconstructions and constructive syntheses.

Iroegbu inaugurated this drive but it was Asouzu who has made the most of it. His theory of Ibuanyidanda ontology or complementary reflection maintains that “to be” simply means to be in a mutual, complementary relationship (2007: 251-55). Every being, therefore, is a variable with capacity to join a mutual interaction. In this capacity every being alone is seen as a missing link and serving a missing link of reality in the network of realities. One immediately suspects the apparent contradiction that might arise from the fusion of two opposed variables when considered logically. But the logic of this theory is not the two-valued classical logic but the three-valued African logic (cf. Chimakonam 2012, 2013 and 2014a). In this, the two standard values are contraries rather than contradictories thereby facilitating effective complementation of variables. The possibility of the two standard values merging to form the third value in the complementary mode is what makes ezumezu logic a powerful tool of thought.

Other emerging theories of conversational and reconstructive African philosophy came later. These include the Interrogatory Theory of J. O. Chimakonam; Njikoka philosophy, or integrative humanism, credited to Godfrey Ozumba and J. O. Chimakonam consolationism, which is credited to the emerging Nigerian philosopher Ada Agada and Afrizealotism developed by E. G. Ekwuru are some of the theories that have left their domains and are spreading.

Interrogatory Theory is a social philosophy which holds that societies ride on the wheels of institutions. Institutions are social structures or building blocks of any society. Repressive colonial times in Africa replaced traditional institutions with non-compatible ones ignoring any usable part of tradition and admittted without censorship every element in the imposed modernity. Hence, social structures in postcolonial Africa are ram-shackled, creating the massive retrogression of the continent’s social order. To get Africa on its feet and moving in the right direction requires the reconstruction of the social structures of Africa’s modernity and the construction of its futurity. Interrogatory theory is therefore conceived as a conversational algorithm that would provide the theoretical base for the African renaissance (Chimakonam 2014b: 1). It constructively questions rather than being exclusively critical; it questions to reconstruct rather than being merely critical to deconstruct, is dialogical rather than merely individualistic, rigorous rather than merely informative yet radical rather than being conventional.

Njikoka philosophy sees the question of being as central in African philosophy. “To be” therefore, is to be in a mutual, integrative relationship. Njikoka, meaning integration, maintains that being is being only if it is in a network of other beings. Isolated from this network, there is strictly no being because true beings depend for their existences on the mutuality and on the network to which they inevitably belong. This prompts the integrativists to regard every being as a necessarily link of reality (Chimakonam 2013: 79). Within the network of reality, every being therefore is necessary. The same logic which undergirds Asouzu’s Ibuanyidanda philosophy is the driving principle of this theory.

Ada Agada’s consolationism is an existentialist theory which reflects on African experiences. In a way, it seeks to answer such existential questions already raised in Western philosophy but from African perspectives. The melancholy man is the 21st century human beleaguered by existential problems, some of which are beyond him and leave him seeking consolation as the only remaining option. The emotional man, which Senghor erroneously announced as the Negro, was in fact, according to Ada Agada, the universal man. The much taunted reason or rationality of man emerged from emotions. Thus, science, art, religion and philosophy find their bearing in the immanent space of human joy and sadness. The goal of being in the world is a struggle to avoid sadness and achieve joy. Consolationism therefore, subverts the Western category of being and replaces it with the category of mood. For when man fails to achieve joy and is rather sad, he finds consolation by finding God or anything that serves this purpose.

Afrizealotism is an existential theory which seeks to reconstruct the African being, or humanism. In the post colonial era, the African emerged distorted, not purely African but not purely Western. This is due to the colonial contamination of the African system of thought. Afrizealotism therefore, seeks, not to purge the Western influences totally, and certainly not to admit all of African tradition without censorship, but to produce a viable synthesis by sifting new and relevant variables from the Western system that is sufficient without making the new synthesis Western. All the while, it seeks to retain enough relevant African traditions to ensure that the synthesis is African but not archaic. This presupposes a logic that is dynamic and at least three-valued. Like Iroegbu Asouzu, Ozumba, Chimakonam and Agada, the champions of Afrizealotism are building the new edifice by reconstructing the deconstructed domain of thought in the later period of African philosophy. The central approach is conversation. By engaging other African philosophers or tradition in critical and positive discourses, they hope to reconstruct the deconstructed edifice of African philosophy. Hence, the New Era of African philosophy is safe from the retrogressive, perverse dialogues which characterized the early and middle periods.

Also, with the critical deconstruction that occurred in the later part of the middle period and the attendant eclecticism that emerged in the later period, the stage was set for the formidable reconstructions and conversational encounters that marked the arrival of the New Era of African philosophy.

6. Conclusion

The development of African philosophy through the periods yields two vital conceptions for African philosophy, namely that African philosophy is a critical engagement of tradition and individual thinkers on one hand, and on the other hand it is also a critical construction of futurity. When individual African philosophers engage tradition critically in order to ascertain its logical coherency and universal validity, they are doing African philosophy. And when they employ the tools of logic in doing this, they are doing African philosophy. On the second conception, when African philosophers engage in critical conversations with one another and in construction of new thoughts in matters that concern Africa but which are nonetheless universal and projected from African native thought systems, they are doing African philosophy. So, the authentic African philosophy is not just a future project, it can also continue from the past.

On the whole, this essay discussed the journey of African philosophy from the beginning and focused through to the criteria, schools and movements in African philosophical tradition. The historical account of the periods in African philosophy began with the early period through to the middle, the later and finally the new periods of African philosophy have also been covered taking particular interest in the robust, individual contributions. The history of systematic African philosophy is a child of frustration, not wonder. This does not however, imply that African philosophers do not initiate some of their reflections from wonder; they actually do, particularly the emerging conversational school. There are still some questions which trail the development of African philosophy, many of which include, “Must African philosophy be tailored to the pattern of Western philosophy, even in less definitive issues? If African philosophy is found to be different in approach from Western philosophy, — so what? Are logical issues likely to play any major roles in the structure and future of African philosophy? What is the future direction of African philosophy? Is the problem of the language of African philosophy pregnant? Would conversations in contemporary African philosophy totally eschew perverse dialogue? What shall be the rules of engagement in African philosophy?” These questions are likely to shape the next lines of thought in African philosophy.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Abanuka, Batholomew. A History of African Philosophy. Enugu: Snaap Press, 2011.
    • An epochal discussion of African philosophy.
  • Abraham, William. The Mind of Africa. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1962.
    • A philosophical discussion of culture, African thought and colonial times.
  • Achebe, Chinua. Morning yet on Creation Day. London: Heinemann, 1975.
    • A philosophical treatment of African tradition and colonial burden.
  • Anyanwu, K. C. “Philosophical Significance of Myth and Symbol in Dogon World-view”. C. S. Momoh ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989
    • A discussion of the philosophical elements in an African culture.
  • Aristotle. Metaphysica, Translated into English under the editorship of W. D. Ross, M.A., Hon. LL.D (Edin.) Oxford. Vol. VIII, Second Edition, OXFORD at the Clarendon Press 1926. Online Edition. 982b.
    • A translation of Aristotle’s treatise on metaphysics.
  • Asouzu I. Innocent. Ibuanyidanda: New Complementary Ontology Beyond World-Immanentism, Ethnocentric Reduction and Impositions. Litverlag, Münster, Zurich, New Brunswick, London, 2007
    • An African perspective treatment of metaphysics or the theory of complementarity of beings.
  • Babalola, Yai. “Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy. A Review of the Work of P. Hountondji, M. Towa, et al.” Second Order, 2. 2. 1977
    • A Critical review of Hountondji and Towa.
  • Betts, Raymond. Assimilation and Association in French Colonial Territory 1890 to 1915. (First ed. 1961), Reprinted. Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press, 2005
    • A discourse on French colonial policies.
  • Bodunrin, Peter. “The Question of African Philosophy”. Richard Wright (ed) African Philosophy: An Introduction 3rd ed. Lanham: UPA, 1984.
    • A discourse on the nature and universal conception of African philosophy.
  • Cesaire Aimer. Return to My Native Land. London: Penguin Books, 1969
    • A presentation of colonial impact on the mind of the colonized.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan. “Ezumezu: A Variant of Three-valued Logic—Insights and Controversies”. Paper presented at the Annual Conference of the Philosophical Society of Southern Africa. Free State University, Bloemfontein, South Africa. Jan. 20-22, 2014.
    • An articulation of the structure of Ezumezu/African logic tradition.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan.“Principles of Indigenous African Logic: Toward Africa’s Development and Restoration of African Identity” Paper presented at the 19th Annual Conference of International Society for African Philosophy and Studies [ISAPS], ‘50 Years of OAU/AU: Revisiting the Questions of African Unity, Identity and Development’. Department of Philosophy, Nnamdi Azikiwe University, Awka. 27th – 29th May, 2013
    • A presentation of the principles of Ezumezu/African logic tradition.
  • Chimakonam, O. Jonathan.“Integrative Humanism: Extensions and Clarifications”. Integrative Humanism Journal. 3.1, 2013.
    • Further discussions on the theory of integrative humanism.
  • Du Bois, W. E. B. The Souls of Black Folk. (1903). New York: Bantam Classic edition, 1989
    • A discourse on race and cultural imperialism.
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    • An Igbo-African discourse on the nature being.
  • Ekwealor, C. “The Igbo World-View: A General Survey”. The Humanities and All of Us.
  • Emeka Oguegbu (ed) Onitsha: Watchword, 1990.
    • A philosophical presentation of Igbo life-world.
  • Etuk, Udo. “The Possibility of African logic”. The Third Way in African Philosophy, Olusegun Oladipo (ed). Ibadan: Hope Publications, 2002
    • A discussion of the nature and possibility of African logic.
  • Franz, Fanon. The Wretched of the Earth. London: The Chaucer Press, 1965.
    • A critical discourse on race and colonialism.
  • Graiule, Marcel. Conversations with Ogotemmêli, London: Oxford University Press for the International African Institute, 1965.
    • An interlocutory presentation of African philosophy.
  • Gyekye, Kwame.  An Essay in African Philosophical Thought: The Akan Conceptual Scheme. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
    • A discussion of philosophy from an African cultural view point.
  • Hallen, Barry.  A Short History of African Philosophy. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2002.
    • A presentation of the history of African philosophy from thematic and personality perspectives.
  • Hallen, B. and J. O. Sodipo. Knowledge, Belief and Witchcraft:  Analytic Experiments in African Philosophy. Palo Alto, CA: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • An analytic discourse of the universal nature of themes and terms in African philosophy.
  • Hebga, Meinrad. “Logic in Africa”. Philosophy Today, Vol.11 No.4/4 (1958).
    • An extrapolation on the structure of African logical tradition.
  • Hegel, Georg. Lectures on the Philosophy of World History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, reprint 1975
    • Hegel’s discussion of his philosophy of world history.
  • Horton, Robin. “African Traditional Religion and Western Science” in Africa 37: 1 and 2, 1967.
    • A comparison of African and Western thought.
  • Horton, Robin. "Traditional Thought and the Emerging African Philosophy Department: A Comment on the Current Debate” in Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy vol. III No. 1, 1977.
    • A logical critique of the idea of African philosophy.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. African Philosophy: Myth and Reality. Second Revised ed. Bloomington, Indiana: University Press, 1996.
    • A critique of ethnophilosophy and an affirmation of African philosophy as a universal discourse.
  • Hunnings, Gordon. “Logic, Language and Culture”. Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.4, No.1. (1975).
    • A critique of classical logic and its laws in African thought and a suggestion of African logical tradition.
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    • An extrapolation on a possible African logic tradition.
  • Iroegbu, Pantaleon. Metaphysics: The Kpim of Philosophy. Owerri: International Universities Press, 1995.
    • A conversational presentation of theory of being in African philosophy.
  • Jacques, Tomaz. “Philosophy in Black: African Philosophy as a Negritude”. Discursos
    • Postcoloniales Entorno Africa. CIEA7, No. 17,  7th Congress of African Studies.
    • A critique of the rigor of African philosophy as a discipline.
  • James, George . Stolen Legacy: Greek Philosophy is Stolen Egyptian Philosophy. New York: Philosophical Library, 1954.
    • A philosophical discourse on race, culture, imperialism and colonial deceit.
  • Jahn, Janheinz. Muntu: An Outline of Neo-African Culture. New York: Grove Press, 1961.
    • A presentation of a new African culture as a synthesis and as philosophical relevant and rational.
  • Jewsiewicki, Bogumil. “African Historical Studies: Academic Knowledge as ‘usable past’ and Radical Scholarship”. The African Studies Review. Vol. 32. No. 3, December, 1989.
    • A discourse on the value of African tradition to modern scholarship.
  • Keita, Lansana. “The African Philosophical Tradition”. Wright, Richard A., ed. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • An examination of African philosophical heritage.
  • Keita, Lansana. “Contemporary African Philosophy: The Search for a Method”. Tsanay Serequeberhan (ed) African Philosophy: The Essential Readings. New York: Paragon House, 1991.
    • An analysis of methodological issues in and basis of African philosophy.
  • Lambert, Michael. “From Citizenship to Négritude: Making a Difference in Elite Ideologies of Colonized Francophone West Africa”. Comparative Studies in Society and History, Vol. 35, No. 2. (Apr., 1993), pp. 239–262.
    • A discourse on the problems of colonial policies in Francophone West Africa.
  • Lewis Gordon. “African Philosophy’s Search for Identity: Existential Considerations of a recent Effort”. The CLR James Journal, Winter 1997, pp. 98-117.
    • A survey of the identity crisis of African philosophical tradition.
  • Leo Apostel. African Philosophy. Belgium: Scientific Publishers, 1981.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of African philosophy.
  • Levy-Bruhl, Lucien. Primitive Mentality. Paris: University of France Press, 1947.
    • A Eurocentrist presentation of non-European world.
  • Makinde, M.A. Philosophy in Africa. The Substance of African philosophy. C.S. Momoh. Ed. Auchi: African Philosophy Projects’ Publications. 2000.
    • A discourse on the practise and relevance of philosophy in Africa.
  • Masolo, D. A. African Philosophy in Search of Identity. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994.
    • An individual-based presentation of the history of African philosophy.
  • Maurier, Henri. “Do We have an African Philosophy?”. Wright, Richard A., ed. 1984. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • A critique of Ethnophilosophy as authentic African philosophy.
  • Mbiti, John. African Religions and Philosophy. London: Heinemann,1969.
    • A discourse on African philosophical culture.
  • Momoh, Campbell. “Canons of African Philosophy”. Paper presented at the 6th Congress of the Nigerian Philosophical Association. University of Ife, July 31- August 3, 1985.
    • A presentation of the major schools of thought in African philosophy.
  • Momoh, Campbell .ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989.
    • A collection of essays on different issues in African philosophy.
  • Momoh, Campbell. “The Logic Question in African Philosophy”. C. S. Momoh ed. The Substance of African Philosophy. Auchi: APP Publications, 1989.
    • A defense of the thesis of a possible African logic tradition.
  • Mudimbe, V. Y. The Invention of Africa: Gnosis, Philosophy and the Order of Knowledge (African Systems of Thought). Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1988.
    • A discourse on culture, race, Eurocentrism and modern Africa as an invention of Western scholarship.
  • Ngugi wa Thiong’o. 1986. Decolonizing the Mind: The Politics of Language in African Literature. London: J. Curry and Portsmouth, N. H: Heinemann, 1986.
    • A discourse on Eurocentrism, Africa’s decolonization and cultural imperialism.
  • Nkrumah, Kwame. I Speak of Freedom: A Statement of African Ideology. London: Mercury Books, 1961.
    • A discourse on political ideology for Africa.
  • Nkrumah, Kwame. Towards Colonial Freedom. London: Heinemann. (First published in 1945), 1962.
    • A discussion of colonialism and its negative impact on Africa.
  • Nwala, Uzodinma. Igbo Philosophy. London: Lantern Books, 1985.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of Igbo-African philosophical culture.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Freedom and Unity. Dares Salaam: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A discussion of a postcolonial Africa that should thrive on freedom and unity.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Freedom and Socialism. Dares Salaam: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A discourse on the fundamental traits of African socialism.
  • Nyerere, Julius. Ujamaa—Essays on Socialism. Dar-es-Salaam, Tanzania: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • A collection of essays detailing the characteristics of African brand of socialism.
  • Ogbalu, F.C. Ilu Igbo: The Book of Igbo Proverbs. Onitsha: University Publishing Company, 1965.
    • A philosophical presentation of Igbo-African proverbs.
  • Okeke, J. Chimakonam. “Why Can’t There be an African logic?”. Journal of Integrative Humanism. 1. 2. (2011). 141-152.
    • A defense of a possible African logic tradition and a critique of critics.
  • Okere, Theophilus. “The Relation between Culture and Philosophy,” in Uche 2 1976.
    • A discourse on the differences and similarities between culture and philosophy.
  • Okere, Theophilus. African Philosophy: A Historico-Hermeneutical Investigation of the Conditions of Its Possibility. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1983.
    • A hermeneutical discourse on the basis of African philosophy.
  • Okolo, Chukwudum B. Problems of African Philosophy.  Enugu: Cecta Nigeria Press, 1990.
    • An x-ray of the major hindrances facing African philosophy as a discipline.
  • Okoro, C. M. African Philosophy: Question and Debate, A Historical Study. Enugu: Paqon Press, 2004.
    • A historical presentation of the great debate in African philosophy.
  • Oladipo, Olusegun. (ed) The Third Way in African Philosophy. Ibadan: Hope, 2002.
    • A collection of essays on the topical issues in African philosophy of the time.
  • Oladipo, Olusegun. Core Issues in African Philosophy. Ibadan: Hope Publications, 2006.
    • A discussion of central issues of African philosophy.
  • Olela, Henry. “The African Foundations of Greek Philosophy”. Wright, Richard A., ed. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of African philosophy as the source of Greek philosophy.
  • Oluwole, Sophie. Philosophy and Oral Tradition. Lagos: Ark Publications, 1999.
    • A cultural presentation of African philosophy.
  • Omoregbe, Joseph. “African Philosophy: Yesterday and Today”. African Philosophy: An Anthology. Emmanuel Eze (ed.), Massachusetts: Blackwell, 1998.
    • A survey of major issues in the debate and a critique of the Universalist school.
  • Onunwa, Udobata. “Humanism: The Bedrock of African Traditional Religion and Culture”. Religious Humanism. Vol. XXV, No. 2, Spring 1991, Pp 66 – 71.
    • A presentation of Humanism as the basis for African religion and culture.
  • Onyewuenyi, Innocent. African Origin of Greek Philosophy: An Exercise in Afrocentrism. Enugu: SNAAP Press, 1993.
    • An Afrocentrist presentation of philosophy as a child of African thought.
  • Oruka, H. Odera. “The Fundamental Principles in the Question of ‘African Philosophy,’ I.” Second Order 4, no. 1: 44–55, 1975.
    • A discussion of the main issues in the debate on African philosophy.
  • Oruka, H. Odera.“Four Trends in African Philosophy.” In Philosophy in the Present Situation of Africa, edited by Alwin Diemer. Weisbaden, Germany: Franz Steiner Erlagh. (First published in 1978), 1981; Ed.
    • A breakdown of the major schools of thought in the debate on African philosophy.
  • Oruka, H. Odera. Sage Philosophy: Indigenous Thinkers and the Modern Debate on African Philosophy. Leiden: E. J. Brill. 1990.
    • A survey of the journey so far in African philosophy and the identification of two additional schools of thought.
  • Outlaw, Lucius. “African ‘Philosophy’? Deconstructive and Reconstructive Challenges.” In his On Race and Philosophy. New York and London: Routledge. 1996.
    • A presentation of African philosophy as a tool for cultural renaissance.
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Author Information

Jonathan O. Chimakonam
University of Calabar

Locke: Ethics

LockeThe major writings of John Locke (1632–1704) are among the most important texts for understanding some of the central currents in epistemology, metaphysics, politics, religion, and pedagogy in the late 17th and early 18th century in Western Europe. His magnum opus, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689) is the undeniable starting point for the study of empiricism in the early modern period. Locke’s best-known political text, Two Treatises of Government (1693) criticizes the political system according to which kings rule by divine right (First Treatise) and lays the foundation for modern liberalism (Second Treatise). His Letter Concerning Toleration (1689) argues that much civil unrest is borne of the state trying to prevent the practice of different religions. In this text, Locke suggests that the proper domain of government does not include deciding which religious path the people ought to take for salvation—in short, it is an argument for the separation of church and state. Some Thoughts Concerning Education (1693) is a very influential text in early modern Europe that outlines the best way to rear children. It suggests that the virtue of a person is directly related to the habits of body and the habits of mind instilled in them by their educators.

Although these texts enjoy a status of “must-reads,” Locke’s views on ethics or moral philosophy have nowhere near the same high status. The reason for this is, in large part, that Locke never wrote a text devoted to the topic. This omission is surprising given that several of his friends entreated him to set down his thoughts about ethics. They saw that the scattered remarks that Locke makes about morality here and there throughout his works were, at times, quite provocative and in need of further development and defense. But, for reasons unknown to us, Locke never indulged his friends with a more systematic moral philosophy. It is thus up to his readers to stitch together his fragmented remarks about happiness, moral laws, freedom, and virtue in order to see what kind of moral philosophy is woven through the texts and to determine whether it is a coherent position.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Good
    1. Pleasure and Pain
    2. Happiness
  3. The Law of Nature
    1. Existence
    2. Content
    3. Authority
    4. Reconciling the Law with Happiness
  4. Power, Freedom, and Suspending Desire
    1. Passive and Active Powers
    2. The Will
    3. Freedom
    4. Judgment
  5. Living the Moral Life
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources: Books
    3. Secondary Sources: Articles

1. Introduction

While Locke did not write a treatise devoted to a discussion of ethics, there are strands of discussion of morality that weave through many, if not most, of his works. One such strand is evident near the end of his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (hereafter: Essay) where he states that one of the most important aspects of improving our knowledge is to recognize the kinds of things that we can truly know. With this recognition, he says, we are able to finely-tune the focus of our enquiries for optimal results. And, he concludes, given the natural capacities of human beings, “Morality is the proper Science, and Business of Mankind in general” because human beings are both “concerned” and “fitted to search out their Summum Bonum [highest good]” (Essay, Book IV, chapter xii, section 11; hereafter: Essay, IV.xii.11). This claim indicates that Locke takes the investigation of morality to be of utmost importance and gives us good reason to think that Locke’s analysis of the workings of human understanding in general is intimately connected to discovering how the science proper to humankind is to be practiced. The content of the knowledge of ethics includes information about what we, as rational and voluntary agents, ought to do in order to obtain an end, in particular, the end of happiness. It is the science, Locke says, of using the powers that we have as human beings in order to act in such a way that we obtain things that are good and useful for us. As he says: ethics is “the seeking out those Rules, and Measures of humane Actions, which lead to Happiness, and the Means to practice them” (Essay, IV.xxi.3). So, there are several elements in the landscape of Locke’s ethics: happiness or the highest good as the end of human action; the rules that govern human action; the powers that command human action; and the ways and means by which the rules are practiced. While Locke lays out this conception of ethics in the Essay, not all aspects of his definition are explored in detail in that text. So, in order to get the full picture of how he understands each element of his description of ethics, we must often look to several different texts where they receive a fuller treatment. This means that Locke himself does not explain how these elements fit together leaving his overarching theory somewhat of a puzzle for future commentators to contemplate. But, by mining different texts in this way, we can piece together the details of an ethical theory that, while not always obviously coherent, presents a depth and complexity that, at minimum, confirms that this is a puzzle worth trying to solve.

2. The Good

a. Pleasure and Pain

The thread of moral discussion that weaves most consistently throughout the Essay is the subject of happiness. True happiness, on Locke’s account, is associated with the good, which in turn is associated with pleasure. Pleasure, in its turn, is taken by Locke to be the sole motive for human action. This means that the moral theory that is most directly endorsed in the Essay is hedonism.

On Locke’s view, ideas come to us by two means: sensation and reflection. This view is the cornerstone of his empiricism. According to this theory, there is no such thing as innate ideas or ideas that are inborn in the human mind. All ideas come to us by experience. Locke describes sensation as the “great source” of all our ideas and as wholly dependent on the contact between our sensory organs and the external world. The other source of ideas, reflection or “internal sense,” is dependent on the mind’s reflecting on its own operations, in particular the “satisfaction or uneasiness arising from any thought” (Essay, II.i.4). What’s more, Locke states that pleasure and pain are joined to almost all of our ideas both of sensation and of reflection (Essay, II.vii.2). This means that our mental content is organized, at least in one way, by ideas that are associated with pleasure and ideas that are associated with pain. That our ideas are associated with pains and pleasures seems compatible with our phenomenal experience: the contact between the sense organ of touch and a hot stove will result in an idea of the hot stove annexed by the idea of pain, or the act of remembering a romantic first kiss brings with it the idea of pleasure. And, Locke adds, it makes sense to join our ideas to the ideas of pleasure and pain because if our ideas were not joined with either pleasure of pain, we would have no reason to prefer the doing of one action over another, or the consideration of one idea over another. If this were our situation, we would have no reason to act—either physically or mentally (Essay, II.viii.3). That pleasure and pain are given this motivational role in action entails that Locke endorses hedonism: the pursuit of pleasure and the avoidance of pain are the sole motives for action.

Locke notes that among all the ideas that we receive by sensation and reflection, pleasure and pain are very important. And, he notes that the things that we describe as evil are no more than the things that are annexed to the idea of pain, and the things that we describe as good are no more than the things that are annexed to the idea of pleasure. In other words, the presence of good or evil is nothing other than the way a particular idea relates to us—either pleasurably or painfully. This means that on Locke’s view, good is just the category of things that tend to cause or increase pleasure or decrease pain in us, and evil is just the category of things that tend to cause or increase pain or decrease pleasure in us (Essay, II.xx.2). Now, we might think that, morally speaking, this way of defining good and evil gets Locke into trouble. Consider the following scenario. Smith enjoys breaking her promises. In other words, failing to honor her word brings her pleasure. According to the view just described, it seems that breaking promises, at least for Smith, is a good. For, if good and evil are defined as nothing more than pleasure and pain, it seems that if something gives Smith pleasure, it is impossible to deny that it is a good. This would be an unwelcome effect of Locke’s view, for it would indicate that his system leads directly to a kind of moral relativism. If promise breaking is pleasurable for Smith and promise keeping is pleasurable for her friend Jones and pleasure is the sign of the good, then it seems that the good is relative and there is no sense in which we can say that Jones is right about what is good and Smith is wrong. Locke blocks this kind of consequence for his view by introducing a distinction between “happiness” and “true happiness.” This indicates that while all things that bring us pleasure are linked to happiness, there is also a category of pleasure-bringing things that are linked to true happiness. It is the pursuit of the members of this special category of pleasurable things that is, for Locke, emblematic of the correct use of our intellectual powers.

b. Happiness

Locke is very clear—we all constantly desire happiness. All of our actions, on his view, are oriented towards securing happiness. Uneasiness, Locke’s technical term for being in a state of pain and desirous of some absent good, is the motive that moves us to act in the way that is expected to relieve the pain of desire and secure the state of happiness (Essay, II.xxi.36). But, while Locke equates pleasure with good, he is careful to distinguish the happiness that is acquired as a result of the satisfaction of any particular desire and the true happiness that is the result of the satisfaction of a particular kind of desire. Drawing this distinction allows Locke to hold that the pursuit of a certain sets of pleasures or goods is more worthy than the pursuit of others.

The pursuit of true happiness, according to Locke, is equated with “the highest perfection of intellectual nature” (Essay, II.xxi.51). And, indeed, Locke takes our pursuit of this true happiness to be the thing to which the vast majority of our efforts should be oriented. To do this, he says that we need to try to match our desires to “the true instrinsick good” that is really within things. Notice here that Locke is implying that there is distinction to be drawn between the “true intrinsic good” of a thing and, it seems, the good that we unreflectively take to be within a certain thing. The idea here is that attentively considering a particular thing will allow us to see its true value as opposed to the superficial value we assign to a thing based on our immediate reaction to it. We can think, for example, of a bitter tasting medicine. A face-value assessment of the medicine will lead us to evaluate that the thing is to be avoided. However, more information and contemplation of it will lead us to see that the true worth of the medicine is, in fact, high and so it should be evaluated as a good to be pursued. And, Locke states, if we contemplate a thing long enough, and see clearly the measure of its true worth; we can change our desire and uneasiness for it in proportion to that worth (Essay, II.xxi.53). But how are we to understand Locke’s suggestion that there is a true, intrinsic good in things? So far, all he has said about the good is that it is tracked by pleasure. We begin to get an answer to this question when Locke acknowledges the obvious fact that different people derive pleasure and pain from different things. While he reiterates that happiness is no more than the possession of those things that give the most pleasure and the absence of those things that cause the most pain, and that the objects in these two categories can vary widely among people, he adds the following provocative statement:

 If therefore Men in this Life only have hope; if in this Life they can only enjoy, 'tis not strange, nor unreasonable, that they should seek their Happiness by avoiding all things, that disease them here, and by pursuing all that delight them; wherein it will be no wonder to find variety and difference. For if there be no Prospect beyond the Grave, the inference is certainly right, Let us eat and drink, let us enjoy what we delight in, for tomorrow we shall die [Isa, 22:13; I Cor. 15:32]. (Essay, II.xxi.55)

Here, Locke suggests that pursuing and avoiding the particular things that give us pleasure or pain would be a perfectly acceptable way to live were there “no prospect beyond the grave.” It seems that what Locke means is that if there were no judgment day, which is to say that if our actions were not ultimately judged by God, there would be no reason to do otherwise than to blindly follow our pleasures and flee our pains. Now, given this suggestion, the question, then, is how to distinguish between the things that are pleasurable but that will not help our case on judgment day, and those that will. Locke provides a clue for how to do such a thing when he says that the will is typically determined by those things that are judged to be good by the understanding. However, in many cases we use “wrong measures of good and evil” and end by judging unworthy things to be good. He who makes such a mistake errs because “[t]he eternal Law and Nature of things must not be alter’d to comply with his ill order’d choice” (Essay, II.xxi.56). In other words, there is an ordered way to choose which things to pursue—the things that are in accordance with the eternal law and nature of things—and an ill-ordered way, in accordance with our own palates. This indicates that Locke takes there to be a fixed law that determines which things are worthy of our pursuit, and which are not. This means that Locke takes there to be an important distinction between the good, understood as all objects that are connected to pleasure and the moral good, understood as objects connected to pleasure which are also in conformity with a law. Though the distinctions between good and moral good, and between evil and moral evil are not discussed in any great detail by Locke, he does states that moral good and evil is nothing other than the “Conformity or Disagreement of our voluntary Actions to some Law.” Locke states punishments and rewards are bestowed on us for our following or failure to follow this law by “the Will and Power of the Law-maker” (Essay, II.xxviii.5). So, Locke affirms that moral good and evil are closely tied to the observance or violation of some law, and that the lawmaker has the power to reward or punish those who adhere to or stray from the law.

3. The Law of Nature

a. Existence

In the Essay, the concepts of laws and lawmakers do not receive much treatment beyond Locke’s affirmation that God has decreed laws and that there are rewards and punishments associated with the respect or violation of these laws (Essay, I.iii.6; I.iii.12; II.xxi.70; II.xxviii.6). The two most important questions concerning the role of laws in a system of ethics remain unanswered in the Essay: (1) how do we determine the content of the law? This is the epistemological question. And (2) what kind of authority does the law have to obligate? This is the moral question. Locke spends much time considering these questions in a series of nine essays written some thirty years before the Essay, which are known under the collected title Essays on the Law of Nature (hereafter: Law).

The first essay in the series treats the question of whether there is a “rule of morals, or law of nature given to us.” The answer is unequivocally “yes” (Law, Essay I, page 109; hereafter: Law, I: 109). The reason for this positive answer, in short, is because God exists. Locke appeals to a kind of teleological argument to support the claim of God’s existence, saying that given the organization of the universe, including the organized way in which animal and vegetable bodies propagate, there must be a governing principle that is responsible for the patterns we see on earth. And, if we extend this principle to the existence of human life, Locke claims that it is reasonable to believe that there is a pattern or a law that governs behavior. This law is to be understood as moral good or virtue and, Locke states, it is the decree of God’s will and is discernable by “the light of nature.” Because the law tells us what is and is not in conformity with “rational nature,” it has the status of commanding or prohibiting certain behaviors (Law, I: 111; see also Essay, IV.xix.16). Because all human beings possess, by nature, the faculty of reason, all human beings, at least in principle, can discover the natural law.

Locke offers five reasons for thinking that such a natural law exists. He begins by noting that it is evident that there is some disagreement among people about the content of the law. However, far from thinking that such disagreement casts doubt on the existence of the law, he takes the presence of disagreement about the law as evidence that such a true and objective law exists. Disagreements about the content of the law confirm that everyone is in agreement about the fundamental character of the law—that there are things that are by their nature good or evil—but just disagree about how to interpret the law (Law, I: 115). The existence of the law is further reinforced by the fact that we often pass judgment on our own actions, by way of our conscience, leading to feelings of guilt or pride. Because it is not possible, according to Locke, to pronounce a judgment without the existence of a law, the act of conscience demonstrates that such a natural law exists. Third, again appealing to a kind of teleological argument, Locke states that we see that laws govern all manner of natural operations and that it makes sense that human beings would also be governed by laws that are in accordance with their nature (Law, I: 117). Fourth, Locke states that without the natural law, society would not be able to run the way that it does. He suggests that the force of civil law is grounded on the natural law. In other words, without the natural law, positive law would have no moral authority. Elsewhere, Locke underlines this point by saying that given that the law of nature is the eternal rule for all men, the rules made by legislators must conform to this law (The Two Treatises of Government, Treatise II, section 135, hereafter: Government, II.35). Finally, on Locke’s view, there would be no virtue or vice, no reward or punishment, no guilt, if there were no natural law (Law, I: 119). Without the natural law, there would be no bounds on human action. This means that we would be motivated only to do what seems pleasurable and there would be no sense in which anyone could be considered virtuous or vicious. The existence of the natural law, then, allows us to be sensitive to the fact that there are certain pleasures that are more in line with what is objectively right. Indeed, Locke also gestures towards, but does not elaborate on, this kind of thought in the Essay. He suggests that the studious man, who takes all his pleasures from reading and learning will eventually be unable to ignore his desires for food and drink. Likewise, the “Epicure,” whose only interest is in the sensory pleasures of food and drink, will eventually turn his attention to study when shame or the desire to “recommend himself to his Mistress” will raise his uneasiness for knowledge (Essay, II.xxi.43).

So, Locke has given us five reasons to accept the existence of the law of nature that grounds virtuous and vicious behavior. We turn now to how he thinks we come to know the content of the law.

b. Content

Locke suggests that there are two ways to determine the content of the law of nature: by the light of nature and by sense experience.

Locke is careful to note that by “light of nature” he does not mean something like an “inward light” that is “implanted in man” and like a compass constantly leads human beings towards virtue. Rather, this light is to be understood as a kind of metaphor that indicates that truth can be attained by each of us individually by nothing more than the exercise of reason and the intellectual faculties (Law, II: 123). Locke uses a comparison to precious metal mining to make this point clear. He acknowledges that some might say that his explanation of the discovery of the content of the law by the light of nature entails that everyone should always be in possession of the knowledge of this content. But, he notes, this is to take the light of nature as something that is stamped on the hearts on human beings, which is a mistake (see Law, III, 137-145). While the depths of the earth might contain veins of gold and silver, Locke says, this does not mean that everyone living on the stretch of land above those veins is rich (Law, II: 135). Work must be done to dig out the precious metals in order to benefit from their value. Similarly, proper use must be made of the faculties we have in order to benefit from the certainty provided by the light of nature. Locke notes that we can come to know the law of nature, in a way, by tradition, which is to say by the testimony and instruction of other people. But it is a mistake to follow the law for any reason other than that we recognize its universal binding force. This can only be done by our own intellectual investigation (Law, II: 129).

But what, exactly, is the light of nature? Locke acknowledges that it is difficult to answer this question—it is not something stamped on the heart or mind, nor is it something that is exclusively learned by tradition or testimony. The only option left for describing it, then, is that it is something acquired or experienced by sense experience or by reason. And, indeed, Locke suggests that when these two faculties, reason and sensation, work together, nothing can remain obscure to the mind. Sensation provides the mind with ideas and reason guides the faculty of sensation and arranges “together the images of things derived from sense-perception, thence forming others [ideas] and composing new ones” (Law, IV: 147). Locke emphasizes that reason ought to be taken to mean “the discursive faculty of the mind, which advances from things known to thinks unknown,” using as its foundation the data provided by sense experience (Law, IV: 149).

When directly addressing the question of how the combination of reason and sense experience allow us to know the content of the law of nature, Locke states that two important truths must be acknowledged because they are “presupposed in the knowledge of any and every law” (Law, IV: 151). First, we must understand that there is a lawmaker who decreed the law, and that the lawmaker is rightly obeyed as a superior power (a discussion of this point is also found in Government, I.81). Second, we must understand that the lawmaker wishes those to whom the law is decreed to follow the law. Let us take each of these in turn.

Sense experience allows us to know that a lawmaker exists. To demonstrate this, Locke appeals, once again, to a kind of teleological argument: by our senses we come to know the objects external world and, importantly, the regularities with which they move and change. We also see that we human beings are part of the movements and changes of the external world. Reason, then, contemplates these regularities and orders of change and motion and naturally comes to inquire about their origin. The conclusion of such an inquiry, states Locke, is that a powerful and wise creator exists. This conclusion follows from two observations: (1) that beasts and inanimate things cannot be the cause of the existence of human beings because they are clearly less perfect than human beings, and something less perfect cannot bring more perfect things into existence, and 2) that we ourselves cannot be the cause of our own existence because if we possessed the power to create ourselves, we would also have the power to give ourselves eternal life. Because it is obviously the case that we do not have eternal life, Locke concludes that we cannot be the origin of our own existence. So, Locke says, there must be a powerful agent, God, who is the origin of our existence (Law, IV: 153). The senses provide the data from the external world, and reason contemplates the data and concludes that a creator of the observed objects and phenomena must exist. Once the existence of a creator is determined, Locke thinks that we can also see that the creator has “a just and inevitable command over us and at His pleasure can raise us up or throw us down, and make us by the same commanding power happy or miserable” (Law, IV: 155). This commanding power, on Locke’s view, indicates that we are necessarily subject to the decrees of God’s will. (A similar line of discussion is found in Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity, 144–46.)

As for the second truth, that the lawmaker, God, wishes us to follow the laws decreed, Locke states that once we see that there is a creator of all things and that an order obtains among them, we see that the creator is both powerful and wise. It follows from these evident attributes that God would not create something without a purpose. Moreover, we notice that our minds and bodies seem well equipped for action, which suggests, “God intends man to do something.” And, the “something” that we are made to do, according to Locke, is the same purpose shared by all created things—the glorification of God (Law, IV: 157). In the case of rational beings, Locke states that given our nature, our function is to use sense experience and reason in order to discover, contemplate, and praise God’s creation; to create a society with other people and to work to maintain and preserve both oneself and the community. And this, in fact, is the content of the law of nature—to preserve one’s own being and to work to maintain and preserve the beings of the other people in our community. This injunction to preserve oneself and to preserve one’s neighbors is also endorsed and stressed throughout Locke’s discussions of political power and freedom (see Government, I.86, 88, 120; II.6, 25, 128).

c. Authority

Once we have knowledge of the content of the law of nature, we must determine from where it derives its authority. In other words, we must ask why we are bound to follow the law once we are aware of its content. Locke begins this discussion by reiterating that the law of nature “is the care and preservation of oneself.” Given this law, he states that virtue should not be understood as a duty but rather the “convenience” of human beings. In this sense, the good is nothing more than what is useful. Further, he adds, the observance of this law is not so much an obligation but rather “a privilege and an advantage, to which we are led by expediency” (Law, VI: 181). This indicates that Locke thinks that actions that are in conformity with the law are useful and practical. In other words, it is in our best interest to follow the law. While this characterization of why we in fact follow the law is compelling, there is nevertheless still an inquiry to be made into why we ought to follow the law.

Locke begins his treatment of this question by stating that no one can oblige us to do anything unless the one who obliges has some superior right and power over us. The obligation that is generated between such a superior power and those who are subject to it results in two kinds of duties: (1) the duty to pay obedience to the command of the superior power. Because our faculties are suited to discover the existence of the divine lawmaker, Locke takes it to be impossible to avoid this discovery, barring some damage or impediment to our faculties. This duty is ultimately grounded in God’s will as the force by which we were created (Law, VI: 183). (2) The duty to suffer punishment as a result of the failure to honor the first duty—obedience. Now, it might seem odd that it would be necessary to postulate that punishment results from the failure to respect a law the content of which is only that we must take care of ourselves. In other words, how could anyone express so little interest in taking care of himself or herself that the fear of punishment is needed to motivate the actions necessary for such care? It is worth quoting Locke’s answer in full:

[A] liability to punishment, which arises from a failure to pay dutiful obedience, so that those who refuse to be led by reason and to own that in the matter of morals and right conduct they are subject to a superior authority may recognize that they are constrained by force and punishment to be submissive to that authority and feel the strength of Him whose will they refuse to follow. And so the force of this obligation seems to be grounded in the authority of a lawmaker, so that power compels those who cannot be moved by warnings. (Law, VI: 183)

So, even though the existence, content, and authority of the law of nature are known in virtue of the faculties possessed by all rational creatures—sense experience and reason—Locke recognizes that there are people who “refuse to be led by reason.” Because these people do not see the binding force of the law by their faculties alone, they need some other impetus to motivate their behavior. But, Locke thinks very ill of those who are in need of this other impetus. He says the these features of the law of nature can be discovered by anyone who is diligent about directing their mind to them, and can be concealed from no one “unless he loves blindness and darkness and casts off nature in order that he may avoid his duty” (Law, VI: 189, see also Government, II.6).

d. Reconciling the Law with Happiness

The main lines of Locke’s natural law theory are as follows: there is a moral law that is (1) discoverable by the combined work of reason and sense experience, and (2) binding on human beings in virtue of being decreed by God. Now, in §1 above, we saw that Locke thinks that all human beings are naturally oriented to the pursuit of happiness. This is because we are motivated to pursue things if they promise pleasure and to avoid things if they promise pain. It has seemed to many commentators that these two discussions of moral principles are in tension with each other. On the view described in Law, Locke straightforwardly appeals to reason and our ability to understand the nature of God’s attributes to ground our obligation to follow the law of nature. In other words, what is lawful ought to be followed because God wills it and what is unlawful ought to be rejected because it is not willed by God. Because we can straightforwardly see that God is the law-giver and that we are by nature subordinate to Him, we ought to follow the law. By contrast, in the discussion of happiness and pleasure in the Essay, Locke explains that good and evil reduce to what is pleasurable and what is painful. While he does also indicate that the special categories of good and evil—moral good and moral evil—are no more than the conformity or disagreement between our actions and a law, he immediately adds that such conformity or disagreement is followed by rewards or punishments that flow from the lawmaker’s will. From this discussion, then, it is difficult to see whether Locke holds that it is the reward and punishment that binds human beings to act in accordance with the law, or if it is the fact that the law is willed by God.

One way to approach this problem is to suggest that Locke changed his mind. Because of the thirty-year gap between Law and the Essay, we might be tempted to think that the more rationalist picture, where the law and its authority are based on reason, was the young Locke’s view when he wrote Law. This view, the story would go, was replaced by Locke’s more considered and mature view, hedonism. But this approach must be resisted because both theories are present in early and late works. The role of pleasure and pain with respect to morality is present not only in the Essay, but is invoked in Law (passage quoted at the end of §2c), and many other various minor essays written in the years between Law and Essay (for example, ‘Morality’ (c.1677–78) in Political Essays, 267–69). Likewise, the role of the authority of God's will is retained after Law, again evident in various minor essays (for example, ‘Virtue B’ (1681) in Political Essays, 287-88), Government II.6), Locke’s correspondence (for example, to James Tyrrell, 4 August 1690, Correspondence, Vol.4, letter n.1309) and even in the Essay itself (II.xxviii.8). An answer to how we might reconcile these two positions is suggested when we consider the texts where appeals to both theories are found side-by-side in certain passages.

In his essay Of Ethick in General (c. 1686–88) Locke affirms the hedonist view that happiness and misery consist only in pleasure and pain, and that we all naturally seek happiness. But in the very next paragraph, he states that there is an important difference between moral and natural good and evil—the pleasure and pain that are consequences of virtuous and vicious behavior are grounded in the divine will. Locke notes that drinking to excess leads to pain in the form of headache or nausea. This is an example of a natural evil. By contrast, transgressing a law would not have any painful consequences if the law were not decreed by a superior lawmaker. He adds that it is impossible to motivate the actions of rational agents without the promise of pain or pleasure (Of Ethick in General, §8). From these considerations, Locke suggests that the proper foundation of morality, a foundation that will entail an obligation to moral principles, needs two things. First, we need the proof of a law, which presupposes the existence of a lawmaker who is superior to those to whom the law is decreed. The lawmaker has the right to ordain the law and the power to reward and punish. Second, it must be shown that the content of the law is discoverable to humankind (Of Ethick in General, §12). In this text it seems that Locke suggests that both the force and authority of the divine decree and the promise of reward and punishment are necessary for the proper foundation of an obligating moral law.

A similar line of argument is found in the Essay. There, Locke asserts that in order to judge moral success or failure, we need a rule by which to measure and judge action. Further, each rule of this sort has an “enforcement of Good and Evil.” This is because, according to Locke, “where-ever we suppose a Law, suppose also some Reward or Punishment annexed to that Law” (Essay, II.xxviii.6). Locke states that some promise of pleasure or pain is necessary in order to determine the will to pursue or avoid certain actions. Indeed, he puts the point even more strongly, saying that it would be in vain for the intelligent being who decrees the rule of law to so decree without entailing reward or punishment for the obedient or the unfaithful (see also Government, II.7). It seems, then, that reason discovers the fact that a divine law exists and that it derives from the divine will and, as such, is binding. We might think, as Stephen Darwall suggests in The British Moralists and the Internal Ought, that if reason is that which discovers our obligation to the law, the role for reward and punishment is to motivate our obedience to the law. While this succeeds in making room for both the rationalist and hedonist strains in Locke’s view, some other texts seem to indicate that by reason alone we ought to be motivated to follow moral laws.

One striking instance of this kind of suggestion is found in the third book of the Essay where Locke boldly states that “Morality is capable of Demonstration” in the same way as mathematics (Essay, III.xi.16). He explains that once we understand the existence and nature of God as a supreme being who is infinite in power, goodness, and wisdom and on whom we depend, and our own nature “as understanding, rational Beings,” we should be able to see that these two things together provide the foundation of both our duty and the appropriate rules of action. On Locke’s view, with focused attention the measures of right and wrong will become as clear to us as the propositions of mathematics (Essay, IV.iii.18). He gives two examples of such certain moral principles to make the point: (1) “Where there is no Property, there is no Injustice” and (2) “No Government allows absolute Liberty.” He explains that property implies a right to something and injustice is the violation of a right to something. So, if we clearly see the intensional definition of each term, we see that (1) is necessarily true. Similarly, government indicates the establishment of a society based on certain rules, and absolute liberty is the freedom from any and all rules. Again, if we understand the definitions of the two terms in the proposition, it becomes obvious that (2) is necessarily true. And, Locke states, following this logic, 1 and 2 are as certain as the proposition that “a Triangle has three Angles equal to two right ones” (Essay, IV.iii.18). If moral principles have the same status as mathematical principles, it is difficult to see why we would need further inducement to use these principles to guide our behavior. While there is no clear answer to this question, Locke does provide a way to understand the role of reward and punishment in our obligation to moral principles despite the fact that it seems that they ought to obligate by reason alone.

Early in the Essay, over the course of giving arguments against the existence of innate ideas, Locke addresses the possibility of innate moral principles. He begins by saying that for any proposed moral rule human beings can, with good reason, demand justification. This precludes the possibility of innate moral principles because, if they were innate, they would be self-evident and thus would not be candidates for justification. Next, Locke notes that despite the fact that there are no innate moral principles, there are certain principles that are undeniable, for example, that “men should keep their Compacts.” However, when asked why people follow this rule, different answers are given. A “Hobbist” will say that it is because the public requires it, and the “Leviathan” will punish those who disobey the law. A “Heathen” philosopher will say that it is because following such a law is a virtue, which is the highest perfection for human beings. But a Christian philosopher, the category to which Locke belongs, will say that it is because “God, who has the Power of eternal Life and Death, requires it of us” (Essay, I.iii.5). Locke builds on this statement in the following section when he notes that while the existence of God and the truth of our obedience to Him is made manifest by the light of reason, it is possible that there are people who accept the truth of moral principles, and follow them, without knowing or accepting the “true ground of Morality; which can only be the Will and Law of God” (Essay, I.iii.6). Here Locke is suggesting that we can accept a true moral law as binding and follow it as such, but for the wrong reasons. This means that while the Hobbist, the Heathen, and the Christian might all take the same law of keeping one’s compacts to be obligating, only the Christian does it for the right reason—that God’s will requires our obedience to that law. Indeed, Locke states that if we receive truths by revelation they too must be subject to reason, for to follow truths based on revelation alone is insufficient (see Essay, IV.xviii).

Now, to determine the role of pain and pleasure in this story, we turn to Locke’s discussion of the role of pain and pleasure in general. He says that God has joined pains and pleasures to our interaction with many things in our environment in order to alert us to things that are harmful or helpful to the preservation of our bodies (Essay, II.vii.4). But, beyond this, Locke notes that there is another reason that God has joined pleasure and pain to almost all our thoughts and sensations: so that we experience imperfections and dissatisfactions. He states that the kinds of pleasures that we experience in connection to finite things are ephemeral and not representative of complete happiness. This dissatisfaction coupled with the natural drive to obtain happiness opens the possibility of our being led to seek our pleasure in God, where we anticipate a more stable and, perhaps, permanent happiness. Appreciating this reason why pleasure and pain are annexed to most of our ideas will, according to Locke, lead the way to the ultimate aim of the enquiry in human understanding—the knowledge and veneration of God (Essay, II.vii.5–6). So, Locke seems to be suggesting here that pain and pleasure prompt us to find out about God, in whom complete and eternal happiness is possible. This search, in turn, leads us to knowledge of God, which will include the knowledge that He ought to be obeyed in virtue of His decrees alone. Pleasure and pain, reward and punishment, on this interpretation, are the means by which we are led to know God’s nature, which, once known, motivates obedience to His laws. This mechanism supports Locke’s claim that real happiness is to be found in the perfection of our intellectual nature—in embarking on the search for knowledge of God, we embark on the intellectual journey that will lead to the kind of knowledge that brings permanent pleasure. This at least suggests that the knowledge of God has the happy double-effect of leading to both more stable happiness and the understanding that God is to be obeyed in virtue of His divine will alone.

But given that all human beings experience pain and pleasure, Locke needs to explain how it is that certain people are virtuous, having followed the experience of dissatisfaction to arrive at the knowledge of God, and other people are vicious, who seek pleasure and avoid pain for no reason other than their own hedonic sensations.

4. Power, Freedom, and Suspending Desire

a. Passive and Active Powers

In any discussion of ethics, it is important not only to determine what, exactly, counts as virtuous and vicious behavior, but also the extent to which we are in control of our actions. This is important because we want to be able to adequately connect behavior to agents in order to attribute praise or blame, reward or punishment to an agent, we need to be able to see the way in which she is the causal source of her own actions. Locke addresses this issue in one of the longest chapters of the Essay—“Of Power.” In this chapter, Locke describes how he understands the nature of power, the human will, freedom and its connection to happiness, and, finally, the reasons why many (or even most) people do not exercise their freedom in the right kind of way and are unhappy as a result. It is worth noting here that this chapter of the Essay underwent major revisions throughout the five editions of the Essay and in particular between the first and second edition. The present discussion is based on the fourth edition of the Essay (but see the “References and Further Reading” below for articles that discuss the relevance of the changes throughout all five editions).

Locke states that we come to have the idea of “power” by observing the fact that things change over time. Finite objects are changed as a result of interactions with other finite objects (for example fire melts gold) and we notice that our own ideas change either as a result of external stimulus (for example the noise of a jackhammer interrupts the contemplation of a logic problem) or as a result of our own desires (for example hunger interrupts the contemplation of a logic problem). The idea of power always includes some kind of relation to action or change. The passive side of power entails the ability to be changed and the active side of power entails the ability to make change. Our observation of almost all sensible things furnishes us with the idea of passive power. This is because sensible things appear to be in almost constant flux—they are changed by their interaction with other sensible things, with heat, cold, rain, and time. And, Locke adds, such observations give us no fewer instances of the idea of active power, for “whatever Change is observed, the Mind must collect a Power somewhere, able to make that Change” (Essay, II.xxi.4). However, when it comes to active powers, Locke states that the clearest and most distinct idea of active power comes to us from the observation of the operations of our own minds. He elaborates by stating that there are two kinds of activities with which we are familiar: thinking and motion. When we consider body in general, Locke states that it is obvious that we receive no idea of thinking, which only comes from a contemplation of the operations of our own minds. But neither does body provide the idea of the beginning of motion, only of the continuation or transfer of motion. The idea of the beginning of motion, which is the idea associated with the active power of motion, only comes to us when we reflect “on what passes in our selves, where we find by Experience, that barely by willing it, barely by a thought of the Mind, we can move the parts of our Bodies, which were before at rest” (Essay, II.xxi.4). So, it seems, the operation of our minds, in particular the connection between one kind of thought, willing, and a change in either the content of our minds or the orientation of our bodies, provides us with the idea of an active power.

b. The Will

The power to stop, start, or continue an action of the mind or of the body is what Locke calls the will. When the power of the will is exercised, a volition (or willing) occurs. Any action (or forbearance of action) that follows volition is considered voluntary. The power of the will is coupled with the power of the understanding. This latter power is defined as the power of perceiving ideas and their agreement or disagreement with one another. The understanding, then, provides ideas to the mind and the will, depending on the content of these ideas, prefers certain courses of action to others. Locke explains that the will directs action according to its preference—and here we must understand “preference” in the most general sense of inclination, partiality, or taste. In short, the will is attracted to actions that promise the procurement of pleasing things and/or the distancing from displeasing things. The technical term that Locke uses to describe that which determines the will is uneasiness. He elaborates, stating that the reason why any action is continued is “the present satisfaction in it” and the reason why any action is taken to move to a new state is dissatisfaction (Essay, II.xxi.29). Indeed, Locke affirms that uneasiness, at bottom, is really no more than desire, where the mind is disturbed by a “want of some absent good” (Essay, II.xxi.31). So, any pain or discomfort of the mind or body is a motive for the will to command a change of state so as to move from unease to ease. Locke notes that it is a common fact of life that we often experience multiple uneasinesses at one time, all pressing on us and demanding relief. But, he says, when we ask the question of what determines the will at any one moment, the answer is the most pressing uneasiness (Essay, II.xxi.31). Imagine a situation where you are simultaneously experiencing discomfort as a result of hunger and the anxiety of being under-prepared for tomorrow’s philosophy exam. On Locke’s view the most intense or the most pressing of these uneasinesses will determine your will to command the action that will relieve it. This means that no matter how much you want to stay at the library to study, if hunger comes to be the more pressing than the desire to pass the exam, hunger will determine the will to act, commanding the action that will result in the procurement of food.

While Locke states that the most pressing uneasiness determines the will, he adds that it does so “for the most part, but not always.” This is because he takes the mind to have the power to “suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires” (Essay, II.xxi.47). While a desire is suspended, Locke says, our mind, being temporarily freed from the discomfort of the want for the thing desired, has the opportunity to consider the relative worth of that thing. The idea here is that with appropriate deliberation about the value of the desired thing we will come to see which things are really worth pursuing and which are better left alone. And, Locke states, the conclusion at which we arrive after this intellectual endeavor of consideration and examination will indicate what, exactly, we take to be part of our happiness. And, in turn, by a mechanism that Locke does not describe in any detail, our uneasiness and desire for that thing will change to reflect whether we concluded that the thing does, indeed, play a role in our happiness or not (Essay, II.xxi.56). The problem is that there is no clear explanation for how, exactly, the power to suspend works. Despite this, Locke nowhere indicates that suspension is an action of the mind that is determined by anything other than volition of the will. We know that Locke takes all acts of the will to be determined by uneasiness. So, suspending our desires must be the result of uneasiness for something. Investigating how Locke understands human freedom and judgment will allow us to see what, exactly, we are uneasy for when we are determined to suspend our desires.

c. Freedom

When the nature of the human will is under discussion, we often want to know the extent of this faculty’s freedom. The reason why this question is important is because we want to see how autonomously the will can act. Typically, the question takes the form of: is the will free? Locke unequivocally denies that the will is free, implying, in fact, that it is a category mistake to ask the question at all. This is because, on his view, both the will and freedom are powers of agents, and it is a mistake to think that one power (the will) can have as a property a second power (freedom) (Essay, II.xxi.20). Instead, Locke thinks that the right question to pose is whether the agent is free. He defines freedom in the following way:

[T]he Idea of Liberty, is the Idea of a Power in any Agent to do or forbear any particular Action, according to the determination or thought of the mind, whereby either of them is preferr’d to the other; where either of them is not in the Power of the Agent to be produced by him according to his Volition here he is not a Liberty, that Agent is under Necessity. (Essay, II.xxi.8)

So, Locke considers that an agent is free in acting when her action is connected to her volition in the right kind of way. That is, when her action (or forbearance of action) follows from her volition, she is free. And, her volition is determined by the “thought of the mind” that indicates which action is preferred.

Notice here that Locke takes an agent to be free in acting when she acts according to her preference—this means that her actions are determined by her preference. This plainly shows that Locke does not endorse a kind of freedom of indifference, according to which the will can choose to command an action other than the thing most preferred at a given moment. This is the kind of freedom most often associated with indeterminism. Freedom, then, for Locke, is no more than the ability to execute the action that is taken to result in the most pleasure at a given moment. The problem with this way of defining freedom is that it seems unable to account for the kinds of actions we typically take to be emblematic of virtuous or vicious behavior. This is because we tend to think that the power of freedom is a power that allows us to avoid vicious actions, perhaps especially those that are pleasurable, in order to pursue a righteous path instead. For instance, on the traditional Christian picture, when we wonder about why God would allow Adam to sin, the response given is that Adam was created as a free being. While God could have created beings that, like automata, unfailingly followed the good and the true, He saw that it was all things considered better to create beings that were free to choose their own actions. This decision was made despite the fact that God foresaw the sinful use to which this freedom would be put. This traditional view explains Adam’s sin in the following way: Adam knew that it was God’s commandment that he was not to eat of the tree of knowledge. Adam also knew that following God’s commandment was the right thing to do. So, in the moment where he was tempted to eat the fruit of the tree of knowledge, he knew it was the wrong thing to do, but did it anyway. This is because, the story goes, and in that moment he was free to decide whether to follow the commandment or to give in to temptation. Of his own free choice, Adam decided to follow temptation. This means that in the moment of original sin, both following God’s commandment and eating the fruit were live options for Adam, and he chose the fruit of his own agency.

Now, on Locke’s system, a different explanation obtains. Given his definition of freedom, it is difficult, at least prima facie, to see how Adam could be blamed for choosing the fruit over the commandment. For, according to Locke, an agent acts freely when her actions are determined by her volitions. So, if Adam’s greatest uneasiness was for the fruit, and the act of eating the fruit was the result of his will commanding such action based on his preference, then he acted freely. But, on this understanding of freedom, it is difficult to see how, exactly, Adam can be morally blamed for eating the fruit. The question now becomes: is Adam to be blamed for anticipating more pleasure from the consumption of the fruit than from following God’s command? In other words, was it possible for Adam to alter the intensity of his desire for the fruit? It seems that on Locke’s view, the answer must be connected to one of the powers he takes human beings to possess—the power to suspend desires. And, in certain passages of the Essay, Locke implies that suspending desires and freedom are linked, suggesting that while agents are acting freely whenever their volitions and actions are linked in the right kind of way, there is, perhaps, a proper use of the power to act freely.

d. Judgment

Locke asserts that the “highest perfection of intellectual nature” is the “pursuit of true and solid happiness.” He adds that taking care not to mistake imaginary happiness for real happiness is “the necessary foundation of our liberty.” And, he writes that the more closely we are focused on the pursuit of true happiness, which is our greatest good, the less our wills are determined to command actions to pursue lesser goods that are not representative of the true good (Essay, II.xxi.51). In other words, the more we are determined by true happiness, the more we will to suspend our desires for lesser things. This suggests that Locke takes there to be a right way to use our power of freedom. Locke indicates that there are instances where it is impossible to resist a particular desire—when a violent passion strikes, for instance. He also states, however, that aside from these kinds of violent passions, we are always able to suspend our desire for any thing in order to give ourselves the time and the emotional distance from the thing desired in which to consider the worth of thing relative to our general goal: true happiness. True happiness, or real bliss, on Locke’s view, is to be found in the pursuit of things that are true intrinsic goods, which promise “exquisite and endless Happiness” in the next life (Essay, II.xxi.70). In other words, true good is something like the Beatific Vision.

Now, Locke admits that it is a common experience to be carried by our wills towards things that we know do not play a role in our overall and true happiness. However, while he allows that the pursuit of things that promise pleasure, even if only a temporary pleasure, represents the action of a free agent, he also says that it is possible for us to be “at Liberty in respect of willing” when we choose “a remote Good as an end to be pursued” (Essay, II.xxi.56). The central thing to note here is that Locke is drawing a distinction between immediate and remote goods. The difference between these two kinds of goods is temporal. For instance, acting to obtain the pleasure of intoxication is to pursue an immediate good while acting to obtain the pleasure of health is to pursue a remote good. So, we can suppose here that Locke is suggesting that forgoing immediate goods and privileging remote goods is characteristic of the right use of liberty (but see Rickless for an alternative interpretation). If this is so, it is certainly not a difficult suggestion to accept. Indeed, it is fairly straightforwardly clear that many immediate pleasures do not, in the end, contribute to overall and long-lasting happiness.

The question now, and it is a question that Locke himself poses, is “How Men come often to prefer the worse to the better; and to chase that, which, by their own Confession, has made them miserable” (Essay, II.xxi.56). Locke gives two answers. First, bad luck can account for people not pursuing their true happiness. For instance, someone who is afflicted with an illness, injury, or tragedy is consumed by her pain and is thus unable to adequately focus on remote pleasures. Quoting Locke’s second answer “Other uneasinesses arise from our desire of absent good; which desires always bear proportion to, and depend on the judgment we make, and the relish we have of any absent good; in both which we are apt to be variously misled, and that by our own fault” (Essay, II.xxi.57).

Here Locke states that our own faulty judgment is to blame for our preferring the worse to the better. This is because, on his view, the uneasiness we have for any given object is directly proportional to the judgments we make about the merit of the things to which we are attracted. So, if we are most uneasy for immediate pleasures, it is our own fault because we have judged these things to be best for us. In this way, Locke makes room in his system for praiseworthiness and blameworthiness with respect to our desires: absent illness, injury, or tragedy, we ourselves are responsible for endorsing, through judgment, our uneasinesses. He continues, stating that the major reason why we often misjudge the value of things for our true happiness is that our current state fools us into thinking that we are, in fact, truly happy. Because it is difficult for us to consider the state of true, eternal happiness, we tend to think that in those moments when we enjoy pleasure and feel no uneasiness, we are truly happy. But such thoughts are mistaken on his view. Indeed, as Locke says, the greatest reason why so few people are moved to pursue the greatest, remote good is that most people are convinced that they can be truly happy without it.

The cause of our mistaken judgments is the fact that it is very difficult for us to compare present and immediate pleasures and pains with future or remote pleasures and pains. In fact, Locke likens this difficulty to the trouble we typically experience in correctly estimating the size of distant objects. When objects are close to us, it is easy to determine their size. When they are far away, it is much more difficult. Likewise, he says, for pleasures and pains. He notes that if every sip of alcohol were accompanied by headache and nausea, no one would ever drink. But, “the fallacy of a little difference in time” provides the space for us to mistakenly judge that the alcohol contributes to our true happiness (Essay, II.xxi.63). We experience this difficulty of judging remote pleasures and pains due to the “weak and narrow Constitution of our Minds” (Essay, II.xxi.64). The condition of our minds makes it easy for us to think that there could be no greater good than the relief of being unburdened of a present pain. In order to correct this problem and convince a man to judge that his greatest good is to be found in a remote thing, Locke says that all we must do is convince him that “Virtue and Religion are necessary to his Happiness” (Essay, II.xxi.60). Locke explains that a “due consideration will do it in most cases; and practice, application, and custom in most” (Essay, II.xxi.69). The suggestion is that contemplation and deliberation alone may be sufficient to correct our problem of considering all immediate pleasures and pains to be greater than any future ones. And, if that does not work, practice and habit can also correct this problem. By practice and exposure, we can, according to Locke, change the agreeableness or disagreeableness of things. It seems, then, that the power to suspend desire must be the power to reject immediate pleasures in favor of the pursuit of remote or future pleasures. However, it seems that in order to suspend in this way, we must already have judged that these immediate pleasures are not representative of the true good. For, without this kind of prior judgment, it seems that we would not be in a position to suspend in the way that is required. This is because absent the prior judgment, there would be no reason for the uneasiness we felt for the perceived good to not determine the will. The question to resolve now is how to get ourselves into a position where we are uneasy for the remote, true good and can suspend our desires for immediate pleasures. In other words, we must determine how we can come to seriously judge immediate pleasures to not have a part in our true happiness.

5. Living the Moral Life

In order to behave in a way that will lead us to the greatest and truest happiness, we must come to judge the remote and future good, the “unspeakable,” “infinite,” and “eternal” joys of heaven to be our greatest and thus most pleasurable good (Essay, II.xxi.37–38). But, on Locke’s view, our actions are always determined by the thing we are most uneasy about at any given moment. So, it seems, we need to cultivate the uneasiness for the infinite joys of heaven. But if, as Locke suggests, the human condition is such that our minds, in their weak and narrow states, judge immediate pleasures to be representative of the greatest good, it is difficult to see how, exactly, we can circumvent this weakened state in order to suspend our more terrestrial desires and thus have the space to correctly judge which things will lead to our true happiness. While in the Essay Locke does not say as much as we might like on this topic, elsewhere in his writings we can get a sense for how he might respond to this question.

In 1684, Locke was asked by his friend Edward Clarke, for advice about raising and educating his children. In 1693, Locke’s musings on this topic were published as Some Thoughts Concerning Education (hereafter: Education). This text provides insight into the importance that Locke places on the connection between the pursuit of true happiness and early childhood education in general. Locke begins his discussion by noting that happiness is crucially dependent on the existence of both a sound mind and a sound body. He adds that it sometimes happens that by a great stroke of luck, someone is born whose constitution is so strong that they do not need help from others to direct their minds towards the things that will make them happy. But this is an extraordinarily rare occurrence. Indeed, Locke notes: “I think I may say, that, of all the men we meet with, nine parts of ten are what they are, good or evil, useful or not, by their education” (Education, §1). It is the education we receive as young children, on Locke’s view, that determines how adept we are at targeting the right objects in order to secure our happiness. He observes that the minds of young children are easily distracted by all kinds of sensory stimuli and notes that the first step to developing a mind that is focused on the right kind of things is to ensure that the body is healthy. Indeed, the objective in physical health is to get the body in the perfect state to be able to obey and carry out the mind’s commands. The more difficult part of this equation is training the mind to “be disposed to consent to nothing, but what may be suitable to the dignity and excellency of a rational creature” (Education, §31). And Locke goes further still, stating that the foundation of all virtue is to be placed in the ability of a human being to “deny himself his own desires, cross his own inclinations, and purely follow what reason directs as best, though the appetite lean the other way” (Education, §33). The way to do this, he says, is to resist immediately present pleasures and pains and to wait to act until reason has determined the value of the desirable things in one’s environment.

Locke states that we must recognize the difference between “natural wants” and “wants of fancy.” The former are the kinds of desires that must be obeyed and that no amount of reasoning will allow us to give up. The latter, however, are created. Locke states that parents and teachers must ensure that children develop the habit of resisting any kind of created fancy, thus keeping the mind free from desires for things that do not lead to true happiness (Education, §107). If parents and teachers are successful in blocking the development of “wants of fancy,” Locke thinks that the children who benefit from this success will become adults who will be “allowed greater liberty” because they will be more closely connected to the dictates of reason and not the dictates of passion (Education, §108). So, in order to live the moral life and listen to reason over passions, it seems that we need to have had the benefit of conscientious care-givers in our infancy and youth (see also Government, II.63). This raises the difficulty of how to connect an individual’s moral successes or failures with the individual herself. For, if she had the bad moral luck of unthinking or careless parents and teachers, it seems difficult to see how she could be blamed for failing to follow a virtuous path.

One way of approaching this difficulty is to recall that Locke takes the content of law of nature, the moral law decreed by God, to be the preservation both of ourselves and of the other people in our communities in order to glorify God (Law, IV). The dictate to help to preserve the other people in our community shifts some of the moral burden from the individual onto the community. This means that it is every individual’s responsibility to do all they can, all things considered, to preserve themselves and to ensure, to the best of their ability, that the children in their communities are raised to avoid developing wants of fancy. In this way, children will develop the habit of suspending their desires for terrestrial pleasures and focusing their efforts on attaining the true happiness that results from acting to secure remote goods.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
    • This is the critical edition of Locke’s Essay. The body of the text is based on the fourth edition of the Essay and all the changes from the first edition through the fifth (1689, 1694, 1695, 1700, 1706) are indicated in the footnotes. The text also includes a comprehensive forward by Nidditch. Note that Locke’s orthography, grammar, and style are often quite different from the way that academic English is written today. In the citations from this text in particular, all emphases, capitalization, and odd spelling are original to Locke.
  • Essays on the Laws of Nature. Edited and translated by W. von Leyden. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954.
    • This edition includes both the original Latin and the English translation of the essays. It also includes Locke’s valedictory speech as censor of moral philosophy at Christ Church and some other shorter pieces of writing. Von Leyden’s introduction provides a very detailed discussion of the sources of Locke’s arguments in these essays, the arguments themselves, and the relations these arguments bear to other of Locke’s writings. It is worth noting here that on von Leyden’s interpretation, it is not possible to render Locke’s discussion of natural law consistent with his endorsement of a hedonistic motivational system in later works.
  • Political Essays. Edited by Mark Goldie. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
    • This collection includes major writings on politics and government, including Essays on the Laws of Nature, Of Ethick in General, and An Essay on Toleration, in addition to many other minor essays.
  • The Correspondence of John Locke, in Eight Volumes. Edited by E.S. De Beer. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1976–89.
    • A complete database of Locke’s correspondence including notes about his correspondents, notes about events and proper names mentioned in letters, as well as signposts for what was going on in Locke’s life at the time he was writing. The first volume of the collection includes an exhaustive introduction to Locke’s life, work, and contacts in the academic and social world; an explanation of how Locke’s letters were preserved; a discussion of previous publications of Locke’s correspondence and how they relate to this collection; and information about transcription practices, including details about editorial grammar decision and dating of the letters.
  • The Works of John Locke, in Nine Volumes, 12th edition. London: Rivington, 1824.
    • This collection includes most of Locke’s longer texts, some shorter texts and a selection of letters. Among other things, the collection contains: Essay (vols.1 and 2), his correspondence with Stillingfleet (vol.3), Two Treatises of Government (vol.4), Letters on Toleration (vol.5), The Reasonableness of Christianity (vol.6), notes on St. Paul's Epistles (vol.7), Some Thoughts Concerning Education and A Discourse of Miracles (vol.8), and a selection of letters (vol.9).

b. Secondary Sources: Books

  • Aaron, Richard I. John Locke. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1971.
    • This is a comprehensive study of Locke’s life and works and includes fifteen very nice pages on Locke’s moral philosophy. Importantly, Aaron concludes that Locke fails to provide his readers  with a science of morals and, in fact, that Locke’s disparate comments about ethics and moral principles cannot be reconciled.
  • Colman, John. John Locke’s Moral Philosophy. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1983.
    • In this study, Colman addresses the major themes and problems of Locke’s moral theory including the connection between law and obligation, and the connection between moral principles and    demonstrability.
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal 'Ought': 1640–1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • This is a deep and broad study of moral philosophy from the mid 17th to the mid 18th century. Locke is one among several central figures under discussion. The reader greatly benefits from Darwall’s careful discussions of the theoretical connections between Locke and his contemporaries and his influences on the topics of natural law, autonomy, motivation, duty, and freedom.
  • Lolordo, Antonia. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
    • In this study, Lolordo draws on different parts of the Essay in order to see Locke’s theory of agency. She argues in favor of the interpretation according to which there are two senses of freedom in Locke’s view, one of which is properly used to attain the goal proper to a moral agent. Of particular interest is her discussion that links Locke’s comments about personal identity to moral agency and her claim that, for Locke, metaphysics is unnecessary for ethics.
  • Mabbot, J.D. John Locke. London: Macmillan Press, 1973.
    • This is a study of Locke’s philosophical system that focuses on knowledge acquisition, logic and language, ethics and theology, and political theory. In his discussion of ethics and theology, Mabbot traces Locke’s discussions of moral principles, their demonstrability, and their binding force through The Two Treatises of GovernmentThe Essays on the Laws of Nature, and An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Schouls, Peter A. Reasoned Freedom: John Locke and Enlightenment. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
    • This is a defense of the view that Locke was a great influence on enlightenment thought, in particular in the domains of reason and freedom. Schouls also points out what he takes to be       many inconsistencies across and sometimes within Locke’s texts.
  • Yaffe, Gideon. Liberty Worth the Name: Locke on Free Agency. New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 2000.
    • This is a book-length study of Locke’s view of human freedom. The content includes careful analysis of the chapter 'Of Power' of the Essay in addition to comments about how this chapter is connected to Locke’s discussion of personal identity. Yaffe defends an interpretation according to which Locke’s view contains two definitions of freedom, only one of which is “worth the name”—the kind of freedom that allows the pursuit of true good.

c. Secondary Sources: Articles

  • Chappell, Vere. “Locke on the Intellectual Basis of Sin.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 32 (1994): 197–207.
  • Chappell, Vere. “Locke on the Liberty of the Will.” In Locke’s Philosophy: Content and Context. Edited by G.A.J. Rogers, 101–21. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Chappell, Vere. “Power in Locke’s Essay.” In The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s “An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.” Edited by Lex Newman, 130–56. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
    • In these articles, Chappell advances the interpretation that changes made in the fifth edition of the Essay indicate that Locke changed his view about human freedom.
  • Darwall, Stephen. “The Foundations of Morality,” In The Cambridge Companion to Early Modern Philosophy. Edited by Donald Rutherford, 221–49.
    • This paper canvasses the main themes explored by and influences on early modern moral theories, including Locke’s.
  • Glauser, Richard. “Thinking and Willing in Locke’s Theory of Human Freedom,” Dialogue 42 (2003): 695–724.
    • Glauser argues that Locke’s view remains consistent across the changes made in the various editions of the Essay.
  • Magri, Tito. “Locke, Suspension of Desire, and the Remote Good,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 8 (2000): 55–70.
    • Magri argues that Locke’s view changes over the course of the different editions of the Essay, in particular that he moves from having an “internalist” view of motivation to having an “externalist” view of motivation. Magri casts doubt on the consistency of Locke’s position.
  • Mathewson, Mark D. “John Locke and the Problems of Moral Knowledge,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 87 (2006): 509–26.
    • Mathewson argues that Locke’s comments about the nature of moral ideas leads to moral subjectivity and relativism.
  • Rickless, Samuel. “Locke on Active Power, Freedom, and Moral Agency,” Locke Studies 13 (2013): 31–51.
  • Rickless, Samuel. “Locke on the Freedom to Will.”  Locke Newsletter 31 (2000): 43–68.
    • In these papers, Rickless argues that Locke holds one and only one definition of freedom: the ability to act according to our volitions. According to Rickless, Locke holds the same definition of freedom as Hobbes. The 2013 paper is a direct argument against the interpretation advanced by Lolordo in Locke’s Moral Man.
  • Schneewind, J.B. “Locke’s Moral Philosophy,” The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Edited by Vere Chappell. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • Schneewind is one commentator who thinks that Locke’s moral philosophy ends up in a contradiction between the natural law view and hedonism.
  • Walsh, Julie. “Locke and the Power to Suspend Desire,” Locke Studies, 14 (2014).
    • Walsh argues that Locke’s view remains consistent and coherent across the various editions of the Essay and emphasizes the role played by suspension and judgment in attaining true happiness.


Author Information

Julie Walsh
Université du Québec à Montréal

Socrates (469—399 B.C.E.)

SocratesSocrates is one of the few individuals whom one could say has so-shaped the cultural and intellectual development of the world that, without him, history would be profoundly different.  He is best known for his association with the Socratic method of question and answer, his claim that he was ignorant (or aware of his own absence of knowledge), and his claim that the unexamined life is not worth living, for human beings. He was the inspiration for Plato, the thinker widely held to be the founder of the Western philosophical tradition.  Plato in turn served as the teacher of Aristotle, thus establishing the famous triad of ancient philosophers: Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle.  Unlike other philosophers of his time and ours, Socrates never wrote anything down but was committed to living simply and to interrogating the everyday views and popular opinions of those in his home city of Athens.  At the age of 70, he was put to death at the hands of his fellow citizens on charges of impiety and corruption of the youth.  His trial, along with the social and political context in which occurred, has warranted as much treatment from historians and classicists as his arguments and methods have from philosophers.

This article gives an overview of Socrates: who he was, what he thought, and his purported method.  It is both historical and philosophical.  At the same time, it contains reflections on the difficult nature of knowing anything about a person who never committed any of his ideas to the written word.  Much of what is known about Socrates comes to us from Plato, although Socrates appears in the works of other ancient writers as well as those who follow Plato in the history of philosophy.  This article recognizes that finding the original Socrates may be impossible, but it attempts to achieve a close approximation.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography: Who was Socrates?
    1. The Historical Socrates
      1. Birth and Early Life
      2. Later Life and Trial
        1. The Peloponnesian War and the Threat to Democracy
        2. Greek Religion and Socrates’ Impiety
    2. The Socratic Problem: the Philosophical Socrates
      1. Origin of the Socratic Problem
      2. Aristophanes
      3. Xenophon
      4. Plato
      5. Aristotle
  2. Content: What does Socrates Think?
    1. Presocratic Philosophy and the Sophists
    2. Socratic Themes in Plato’s Apology
      1. Socratic Ignorance
      2. Priority of the Care of the Soul
      3. The Unexamined Life
    3. Other Socratic Positions and Arguments
      1. Unity of Virtue; All Virtue is Knowledge
      2. No One Errs Knowingly/No One Errs Willingly
      3. All Desire is for the Good
      4. It is Better to Suffer an Injustice Than to Commit One
      5. Eudaimonism
      6. Ruling is An Expertise
    4. Socrates the Ironist
  3. Method: How Did Socrates Do Philosophy?
    1. The Elenchus: Socrates the Refuter
      1. Topic
      2. Purpose
    2. Maieutic: Socrates the Midwife
    3. Dialectic: Socrates the Constructer
  4. Legacy: How Have Other Philosophers Understood Socrates?
    1. Hellenistic Philosophy
      1. The Cynics
      2. The Stoics
      3. The Skeptics
      4. The Epicureans
      5. The Peripatetics
    2. Modern Philosophy
      1. Hegel
      2. Kierkegaard
      3. Nietzsche
      4. Heidegger
      5. Gadamer
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biography: Who was Socrates?

a. The Historical Socrates

i. Birth and Early Life

Socrates was born in Athens in the year 469 B.C.E. to Sophroniscus, a stonemason, and Phaenarete, a midwife.  His family was not extremely poor, but they were by no means wealthy, and Socrates could not claim that he was of noble birth like Plato.  He grew up in the political deme or district of Alopece, and when he turned 18, began to perform the typical political duties required of Athenian males.  These included compulsory military service and membership in the Assembly, the governing body responsible for determining military strategy and legislation.

In a culture that worshipped male beauty, Socrates had the misfortune of being born incredibly ugly.  Many of our ancient sources attest to his rather awkward physical appearance, and Plato more than once makes reference to it (Theaetetus 143e, Symposium, 215a-c; also Xenophon Symposium 4.19, 5.5-7 and Aristophanes Clouds 362).  Socrates was exophthalmic, meaning that his eyes bulged out of his head and were not straight but focused sideways.  He had a snub nose, which made him resemble a pig, and many sources depict him with a potbelly.  Socrates did little to help his odd appearance, frequently wearing the same cloak and sandals throughout both the day and the evening.  Plato’s Symposium (174a) offers us one of the few accounts of his caring for his appearance.

As a young man Socrates was given an education appropriate for a person of his station.  By the middle of the 5th century B.C.E., all Athenian males were taught to read and write. Sophroniscus, however, also took pains to give his son an advanced cultural education in poetry, music, and athletics.  In both Plato and Xenophon, we find a Socrates that is well versed in poetry, talented at music, and quite at-home in the gymnasium.  In accordance with Athenian custom, his father also taught him a trade, though Socrates did not labor at it on a daily basis.  Rather, he spent his days in the agora (the Athenian marketplace), asking questions of those who would speak with him.  While he was poor, he quickly acquired a following of rich young aristocrats—one of whom was Plato—who particularly enjoyed hearing him interrogate those that were purported to be the wisest and most influential men in the city.

Socrates was married to Xanthippe, and according to some sources, had a second wife.  Most suggest that he first married Xanthippe, and that she gave birth to his first son, Lamprocles.  He is alleged to have married his second wife, Myrto, without dowry, and she gave birth to his other two sons, Sophroniscus and Menexenus.  Various accounts attribute Sophroniscus to Xanthippe, while others even suggest that Socrates was married to both women simultaneously because of a shortage of males in Athens at the time.  In accordance with Athenian custom, Socrates was open about his physical attraction to young men, though he always subordinated his physical desire for them to his desire that they improve the condition of their souls.

Socrates fought valiantly during his time in the Athenian military.  Just before the Peloponnesian War with Sparta began in 431 B.C.E, he helped the Athenians win the battle of Potidaea (432 B.C.E.), after which he saved the life of Alcibiades, the famous Athenian general.  He also fought as one of 7,000 hoplites aside 20,000 troops at the battle of Delium (424 B.C.E.) and once more at the battle of Amphipolis (422 B.C.E.).  Both battles were defeats for Athens.

Despite his continued service to his city, many members of Athenian society perceived Socrates to be a threat to their democracy, and it is this suspicion that largely contributed to his conviction in court.  It is therefore imperative to understand the historical context in which his trial was set.

ii. Later Life and Trial

1. The Peloponnesian War and the Threat to Democracy

Between 431—404 B.C.E. Athens fought one of its bloodiest and most protracted conflicts with neighboring Sparta, the war that we now know as the Peloponnesian War.  Aside from the fact that Socrates fought in the conflict, it is important for an account of his life and trial because many of those with whom Socrates spent his time became either sympathetic to the Spartan cause at the very least or traitors to Athens at worst.  This is particularly the case with those from the more aristocratic Athenian families, who tended to favor the rigid and restricted hierarchy of power in Sparta instead of the more widespread democratic distribution of power and free speech to all citizens that obtained in Athens.  Plato more than once places in the mouth of his character Socrates praise for Sparta (Protagoras 342b, Crito 53a; cf. Republic 544c in which most people think the Spartan constitution is the best).  The political regime of the Republic is marked by a small group of ruling elites that preside over the citizens of the ideal city.

There are a number of important historical moments throughout the war leading up to Socrates’ trial that figure in the perception of him as a traitor.  Seven years after the battle of Amphipolis, the Athenian navy was set to invade the island of Sicily, when a number of statues in the city called “herms”, dedicated to the god Hermes, protector of travelers, were destroyed.  Dubbed the ‘Mutilation of the Herms’ (415 B.C.E.), this event engendered not only a fear of those who might seek to undermine the democracy, but those who did not respect the gods.  In conjunction with these crimes, Athens witnessed the profanation of the Eleusinian mysteries, religious rituals that were to be conducted only in the presence of priests but that were in this case performed in private homes without official sanction or recognition of any kind.  Amongst those accused and persecuted on suspicion of involvement in the crimes were a number of Socrates’ associates, including Alcibiades, who was recalled from his position leading the expedition in Sicily.  Rather than face prosecution for the crime, Alcibiades escaped and sought asylum in Sparta.

Though Alcibiades was not the only of Socrates’ associates implicated in the sacrilegious crimes (Charmides and Critias were suspected as well), he is arguably the most important.  Socrates had by many counts been in love with Alcibiades and Plato depicts him pursuing or speaking of his love for him in many dialogues (Symposium 213c-d, Protagoras 309a, Gorgias 481d, Alcibiades I 103a-104c, 131e-132a).  Alcibiades is typically portrayed as a wandering soul (Alcibiades I 117c-d), not committed to any one consistent way of life or definition of justice.  Instead, he was a kind of cameleon-like flatterer that could change and mold himself in order to please crowds and win political favor (Gorgias 482a).  In 411 B.C.E., a group of citizens opposed to the Athenian democracy led a coup against the government in hopes of establishing an oligarchy.  Though the democrats put down the coup later that year and recalled Alcibiades to lead the Athenian fleet in the Hellespont, he aided the oligarchs by securing for them an alliance with the Persian satraps.  Alcibiades therefore did not just aid the Spartan cause but allied himself with Persian interests as well.  His association with the two principal enemies of Athens reflected poorly on Socrates, and Xenophon tells us that Socrates’ repeated association with and love for Alcibiades was instrumental in the suspicion that he was a Spartan apologist.

Sparta finally defeated Athens in 404 B.C.E., just five years before Socrates’ trial and execution.  Instead of a democracy, they installed as rulers a small group of Athenians who were loyal to Spartan interests.  Known as “The Thirty” or sometimes as the “Thirty Tyrants”, they were led by Critias, a known associate of Socrates and a member of his circle.  Critias’ nephew Charmides, about whom we have a Platonic dialogue of the same name, was also a member.  Though Critias put forth a law prohibiting Socrates from conducting discussions with young men under the age of 30, Socrates’ earlier association with him—as well as his willingness to remain in Athens and endure the rule of the Thirty rather than flee—further contributed to the growing suspicion that Socrates was opposed to the democratic ideals of his city.

The Thirty ruled tyrannically—executing a number of wealthy Athenians as well as confiscating their property, arbitrarily arresting those with democratic sympathies, and exiling many others—until they were overthrown in 403 B.C.E. by a group of democratic exiles returning to the city.  Both Critias and Charmides were killed and, after a Spartan-sponsored peace accord, the democracy was restored.  The democrats proclaimed a general amnesty in the city and thereby prevented politically motivated legal prosecutions aimed at redressing the terrible losses incurred during the reign of the Thirty.  Their hope was to maintain unity during the reestablishment of their democracy.

One of Socrates’ main accusers, Anytus, was one of the democratic exiles that returned to the city to assist in the overthrow of the Thirty.  Plato’s Meno, set in the year 402 B.C.E., imagines a conversation between Socrates and Anytus in which the latter argues that any citizen of Athens can teach virtue, an especially democratic view insofar as it assumes knowledge of how to live well is not the restricted domain of the esoteric elite or privileged few.  In the discussion, Socrates argues that if one wants to know about virtue, one should consult an expert on virtue (Meno 91b-94e).  The political turmoil of the city, rebuilding itself as a democracy after nearly thirty years of destruction and bloodshed, constituted a context in which many citizens were especially fearful of threats to their democracy that came not from the outside, but from within their own city.

While many of his fellow citizens found considerable evidence against Socrates, there was also historical evidence in addition to his military service for the case that he was not just a passive but an active supporter of the democracy.  For one thing, just as he had associates that were known oligarchs, he also had associates that were supporters of the democracy, including the metic family of Cephalus and Socrates’ friend Chaerephon, the man who reported that the oracle at Delphi had proclaimed that no man was wiser than Socrates.  Additionally, when he was ordered by the Thirty to help retrieve the democratic general Leon from the island of Salamis for execution, he refused to do so.  His refusal could be understood not as the defiance of a legitimately established government but rather his allegiance to the ideals of due process that were in effect under the previously instituted democracy.  Indeed, in Plato’s Crito, Socrates refuses to escape from prison on the grounds that he lived his whole life with an implied agreement with the laws of the democracy (Crito 50a-54d).  Notwithstanding these facts, there was profound suspicion that Socrates was a threat to the democracy in the years after the end of the Peloponnesian War.  But because of the amnesty, Anytus and his fellow accusers Meletus and Lycon were prevented from bringing suit against Socrates on political grounds.  They opted instead for religious grounds.

2. Greek Religion and Socrates’ Impiety

Because of the amnesty the charges made against Socrates were framed in religious terms.  As recounted by Diogenes Laertius (1.5.40), the charges were stated as follows: “Socrates does criminal wrong by not recognizing the gods that the city recognizes, and furthermore by introducing new divinities; and he also does criminal wrong by corrupting the youth” (other accounts: Xenophon Memorabilia I.I.1 and Apology 11-12, Plato, Apology 24b and Euthyphro 2c-3b).  Many people understood the charge about corrupting the youth to signify that Socrates taught his subversive views to others, a claim that he adamantly denies in his defense speech by claiming that he has no wisdom to teach (Plato, Apology 20c) and that he cannot be held responsible for the actions of those that heard him speak (Plato, Apology 33a-c).

It is now customary to refer to the principal written accusation on the deposition submitted to the Athenian court as an accusation of impiety, or unholiness.  Rituals, ceremonies, and sacrifices that were officially sanctioned by the city and its officials marked ancient Greek religion.  The sacred was woven into the everyday experience of citizens who demonstrated their piety by correctly observing their ancestral traditions.  Interpretation of the gods at their temples was the exclusive domain of priests appointed and recognized by the city.  The boundary and separation between the religious and the secular that we find in many countries today therefore did not obtain in Athens.  A religious crime was consequently an offense not just against the gods, but also against the city itself.

Socrates and his contemporaries lived in a polytheistic society, a society in which the gods did not create the world but were themselves created.  Socrates would have been brought up with the stories of the gods recounted in Hesiod and Homer, in which the gods were not omniscient, omnibenevolent, or eternal, but rather power-hungry super-creatures that regularly intervened in the affairs of human beings.  One thinks for example of Aphrodite saving Paris from death at the hands of Menelaus (Homer, Iliad 3.369-382) or Zeus sending Apollo to rescue the corpse of Sarpedon after his death in battle (Homer, Iliad 16.667-684).  Human beings were to fear the gods, sacrifice to them, and honor them with festivals and prayers.

Socrates instead seemed to have a conception of the divine as always benevolent, truthful, authoritative, and wise.  For him, divinity always operated in accordance with the standards of rationality.  This conception of divinity, however, dispenses with the traditional conception of prayer and sacrifice as motivated by hopes for material payoff.  Socrates’ theory of the divine seemed to make the most important rituals and sacrifices in the city entirely useless, for if the gods are all good, they will benefit human beings regardless of whether or not human beings make offerings to them.  Jurors at his trial might have thought that, without the expectation of material reward or protection from the gods, Socrates was disconnecting religion from its practical roots and its connection with the civic identity of the city.

While Socrates was critical of blind acceptance of the gods and the myths we find in Hesiod and Homer, this in itself was not unheard of in Athens at the time.  Solon, Xenophanes, Heraclitus, and Euripides had all spoken against the capriciousness and excesses of the gods without incurring penalty.  It is possible to make the case that Socrates’ jurors might not have indicted him solely on questioning the gods or even of interrogating the true meaning of piety.  Indeed, there was no legal definition of piety in Athens at the time, and jurors were therefore in a similar situation to the one in which we find Socrates in Plato’s Euthyphro, that is, in need of an inquiry into what the nature of piety truly is.  What seems to have concerned the jurors was not only Socrates’ challenge to the traditional interpretation of the gods of the city, but his seeming allegiance to an entirely novel divine being, unfamiliar to anyone in the city.

This new divine being is what is known as Socrates’ daimon.  Though it has become customary to think of a daimon as a spirit or quasi-divinity (for example, Symposium 202e-203a), in ancient Greek religion it was not solely a specific class of divine being but rather a mode of activity, a force that drives a person when no particular divine agent can be named (Burkett, 180).  Socrates claimed to have heard a sign or voice from his days as a child that accompanied him and forbid him to pursue certain courses of action (Plato, Apology 31c-d, 40a-b, Euthydemus 272e-273a, Euthyphro 3b, Phaedrus 242b, Theages 128-131a, Theaetetus 150c-151b, Rep 496c; Xenophon, Apology 12, Memorabilia 1.1.3-5).  Xenophon adds that the sign also issued positive commands (Memorablia 1.1.4, 4.3.12, 4.8.1, Apology 12).  This sign was accessible only to Socrates, private and internal to his own mind.  Whether Socrates received moral knowledge of any sort from the sign is a matter of scholarly debate, but beyond doubt is the strangeness of Socrates’ insistence that he took private instructions from a deity that was unlicensed by the city.  For all the jurors knew, the deity could have been hostile to Athenian interests.  Socrates’ daimon was therefore extremely influential in his indictment on the charge of worshipping new gods unknown to the city (Plato, Euthyphro 3b, Xenophon, Memorabilia I.1.2).

Whereas in Plato’s Apology Socrates makes no attempt to reconcile his divine sign with traditional views of piety, Xenophon’s Socrates argues that just as there are those who rely on birdcalls and receive guidance from voices, so he too is influenced by his daimon.  However, Socrates had no officially sanctioned religious role in the city.  As such, his attempt to assimilate himself to a seer or necromancer appointed by the city to interpret divine signs actually may have undermined his innocence, rather than help to establish it.  His insistence that he had direct, personal access to the divine made him appear guilty to enough jurors that he was sentenced to death.

b. The Socratic Problem: the Philosophical Socrates

The Socratic problem is the problem faced by historians of philosophy when attempting to reconstruct the ideas of the original Socrates as distinct from his literary representations.  While we know many of the historical details of Socrates’ life and the circumstances surrounding his trial, Socrates’ identity as a philosopher is much more difficult to establish.  Because he wrote nothing, what we know of his ideas and methods comes to us mainly from his contemporaries and disciples.

There were a number of Socrates’ followers who wrote conversations in which he appears.  These works are what are known as the logoi sokratikoi, or Socratic accounts.  Aside from Plato and Xenophon, most of these dialogues have not survived.  What we know of them comes to us from other sources.  For example, very little survives from the dialogues of Antisthenes, whom Xenophon reports as one of Socrates’ leading disciples.  Indeed, from polemics written by the rhetor Isocrates, some scholars have concluded that he was the most prominent Socratic in Athens for the first decade following Socrates’ death.  Diogenes Laertius (6.10-13) attributes to Antisthenes a number of views that we recognize as Socratic, including that virtue is sufficient for happiness, the wise man is self-sufficient, only the virtuous are noble, the virtuous are friends, and good things are morally fine and bad things are base.

Aeschines of Sphettus wrote seven dialogues, all of which have been lost.  It is possible for us to reconstruct the plots of two of them: the Alcibiades—in which Socrates shames Alcibiades into admitting he needs Socrates’ help to be virtuous—and the Aspasia—in which Socrates recommends the famous wife of Pericles as a teacher for the son of Callias.  Aeschines’ dialogues focus on Socrates’ ability to help his interlocutor acquire self-knowledge and better himself.

Phaedo of Elis wrote two dialogues.  His central use of Socrates is to show that philosophy can improve anyone regardless of his social class or natural talents.  Euclides of Megara wrote six dialogues, about which we know only their titles.  Diogenes Laertius reports that he held that the good is one, that insight and prudence are different names for the good, and that what is opposed to the good does not exist.  All three are Socratic themes.  Lastly, Aristippus of Cyrene wrote no Socratic dialogues but is alleged to have written a work entitled To Socrates.

The two Socratics on whom most of our philosophical understanding of Socrates depends are Plato and Xenophon.  Scholars also rely on the works of the comic playwright Aristophanes and Plato’s most famous student, Aristotle.

i. Origin of the Socratic Problem

The Socratic problem first became pronounced in the early 19th century with the influential work of Friedrich Schleiermacher.  Until this point, scholars had largely turned to Xenophon to identify what the historical Socrates thought.  Schleiermacher argued that Xenophon was not a philosopher but rather a simple citizen-soldier, and that his Socrates was so dull and philosophically uninteresting that, reading Xenophon alone, it would be difficult to understand the reputation accorded Socrates by so many of his contemporaries and nearly all the schools of philosophy that followed him.  The better portrait of Socrates, Schleiermacher claimed, comes to us from Plato.

Though many scholars have since jettisoned Xenophon as a legitimate source for representing the philosophical views of the historical Socrates, they remain divided over the reliability of the other three sources.  For one thing, Aristophanes was a comic playwright, and therefore took considerable poetic license when scripting his characters.  Aristotle, born 15 years after Socrates’ death, hears about Socrates primarily from Plato. Plato himself wrote dialogues or philosophical dramas, and thus cannot be understood to be presenting his readers with exact replicas or transcriptions of conversations that Socrates actually had.  Furthermore, many scholars think that Plato’s so-called middle and late dialogues do not present the views of the historical Socrates.

We therefore see the difficult nature of the Socratic problem: because we don’t seem to have any consistently reliable sources, finding the true Socrates or the original Socrates proves to be an impossible task.  What we are left with, instead, is a composite picture assembled from various literary and philosophical components that give us what we might think of as Socratic themes or motifs.

ii. Aristophanes

Born in 450 B.C.E., Aristophanes wrote a number of comic plays intended to satirize and caricature many of his fellow Athenians.  His Clouds (423 B.C.E.) was so instrumental in parodying Socrates and painting him as a dangerous intellectual capable of corrupting the entire city that Socrates felt compelled in his trial defense to allude to the bad reputation he acquired as a result of the play (Plato, Apology 18a-b, 19c).  Aristophanes was much closer in age to Socrates than Plato and Xenophon, and as such is the only one of our sources exposed to Socrates in his younger years.

In the play, Socrates is the head of a phrontistêrion, a school of learning where students are taught the nature of the heavens and how to win court cases.  Socrates appears in a swing high above the stage, purportedly to better study the heavens.  His patron deities, the clouds, represent his interest in meteorology and may also symbolize the lofty nature of reasoning that may take either side of an argument.  The main plot of the play centers on an indebted man called Strepsiades, whose son Phidippides ends up in the school to learn how to help his father avoid paying off his debts.  By the end of the play, Phidippides has beaten his father, arguing that it is perfectly reasonable to do so on the grounds that, just as it is acceptable for a father to spank his son for his own good, so it is acceptable for a son to hit a father for his own good.  In addition to the theme that Socrates corrupts the youth, we therefore also find in the Clouds the origin of the rumor that Socrates makes the stronger argument the weaker and the weaker argument the stronger.  Indeed, the play features a personification of the Stronger Argument—which represents traditional education and values—attacked by the Weaker Argument—which advocates a life of pleasure.

While the Clouds is Aristophanes’ most famous and comprehensive attack on Socrates, Socrates appears in other of his comedies as well.  In the Birds (414 B.C.E.), Aristophanes coins a Greek verb based on Socrates’ name to insinuate that Socrates was truly a Spartan sympathizer (1280-83).  Young men who were found “Socratizing” were expressing their admiration of Sparta and its customs.  And in the Frogs (405), the Chorus claims that it is not refined to keep company with Socrates, who ignores the poets and wastes time with ‘frivolous words’ and ‘pompous word-scraping’ (1491-1499).

Aristophanes’ Socrates is a kind of variegated caricature of trends and new ideas emerging in Athens that he believed were threatening to the city.  We find a number of such themes prevalent in Presocratic philosophy and the teachings of the Sophists, including those about natural science, mathematics, social science, ethics, political philosophy, and the art of words.  Amongst other things, Aristophanes was troubled by the displacement of the divine through scientific explanations of the world and the undermining of traditional morality and custom by explanations of cultural life that appealed to nature instead of the gods.  Additionally, he was reticent about teaching skill in disputation, for fear that a clever speaker could just as easily argue for the truth as argue against it.  These issues constitute what is sometimes called the “new learning” developing in 5th century B.C.E. Athens, for which the Aristophanic Socrates is the iconic symbol.

iii. Xenophon

Born in the same decade as Plato (425 B.C.E.), Xenophon lived in the political deme of Erchia.  Though he knew Socrates he would not have had as much contact with him as Plato did.  He was not present in the courtroom on the day of Socrates’ trial, but rather heard an account of it later on from Hermogenes, a member of Socrates’ circle.  His depiction of Socrates is found principally in four works: Apology—in which Socrates gives a defense of his life before his jurors—Memorabilia—in which Xenophon himself explicates the charges against Socrates and tries to defend him—Symposium—a conversation between Socrates and his friends at a drinking party—and Oeconomicus—a Socratic discourse on estate management.  Socrates also appears in Xenophon’s Hellenica and Anabasis.

Xenophon’s reputation as a source on the life and ideas of Socrates is one on which scholars do not always agree.  Largely thought to be a significant source of information about Socrates before the 19th century, for most of the 20th century Xenophon’s ability to depict Socrates as a philosopher was largely called into question.  Following Schleiermacher, many argued that Xenophon himself was either a bad philosopher who did not understand Socrates, or not a philosopher at all, more concerned with practical, everyday matters like economics.  However, recent scholarship has sought to challenge this interpretation, arguing that it assumes an understanding of philosophy as an exclusively speculative and critical endeavor that does not attend to the ancient conception of philosophy as a comprehensive way of life.

While Plato will likely always remain the principal source on Socrates and Socratic themes, Xenophon’s Socrates is distinct in philosophically interesting ways.  He emphasizes the values of self-mastery (enkrateia), endurance of physical pain (karteria), and self-sufficiency (autarkeia).  For Xenophon’s Socrates, self-mastery or moderation is the foundation of virtue (Memorabilia, 1.5.4).  Whereas in Plato’s Apology the oracle tells Chaerephon that no one is wiser than Socrates, in Xenophon’s Apology Socrates claims that the oracle told Chaerephon that “no man was more free than I, more just, and more moderate” (Xenophon, Apology, 14).

Part of Socrates’ freedom consists in his freedom from want, precisely because he has mastered himself.  As opposed to Plato’s Socrates, Xenophon’s Socrates is not poor, not because he has much, but because he needs little.  Oeconomicus 11.3 for instance shows Socrates displeased with those who think him poor.  One can be rich even with very little on the condition that one has limited his needs, for wealth is just the excess of what one has over what one requires.  Socrates is rich because what he has is sufficient for what he needs (Memorabilia 1.2.1, 1.3.5, 4.2.38-9).

We also find Xenophon attributing to Socrates a proof of the existence of God.  The argument holds that human beings are the product of an intelligent design, and we therefore should conclude that there is a God who is the maker (dēmiourgos) or designer of all things (Memorabilia 1.4.2-7).  God creates a systematically ordered universe and governs it in the way our minds govern our bodies (Memorabilia 1.4.1-19, 4.3.1-18).  While Plato’s Timaeus tells the story of a dēmiourgos creating the world, it is Timaeus, not Socrates, who tells the story.  Indeed, Socrates speaks only sparingly at the beginning of the dialogue, and most scholars do not count as Socratic the cosmological arguments therein.

iv. Plato

Plato was Socrates’ most famous disciple, and the majority of what most people know about Socrates is known about Plato’s Socrates.  Plato was born to one of the wealthiest and politically influential families in Athens in 427 B.C.E., the son of Ariston and Perictione. His brothers were Glaucon and Adeimantus, who are Socrates’ principal interlocutors for the majority of the Republic.  Though Socrates is not present in every Platonic dialogue, he is in the majority of them, often acting as the main interlocutor who drives the conversation.

The attempt to extract Socratic views from Plato’s texts is itself a notoriously difficult problem, bound up with questions about the order in which Plato composed his dialogues, one’s methodological approach to reading them, and whether or not Socrates, or anyone else for that matter, speaks for Plato.  Readers interested in the details of this debate should consult “Plato.”  Generally speaking, the predominant view of Plato’s Socrates in the English-speaking world from the middle to the end of the 20th century was simply that he was Plato’s mouthpiece.  In other words, anything Socrates says in the dialogues is what Plato thought at the time he wrote the dialogue.  This view, put forth by the famous Plato scholar Gregory Vlastos, has been challenged in recent years, with some scholars arguing that Plato has no mouthpiece in the dialogues (see Cooper xxi-xxiii).  While we can attribute to Plato certain doctrines that are consistent throughout his corpus, there is no reason to think that Socrates, or any other speaker, always and consistently espouses these doctrines.

The main interpretive obstacle for those seeking the views of Socrates from Plato is the question of the order of the dialogues.  Thrasyllus, the 1st century (C.E.) Platonist who was the first to arrange the dialogues according to a specific paradigm, organized the dialogues into nine tetralogies, or groups of four, on the basis of the order in which he believed they should be read.  Another approach, customary for most scholars by the late 20th century, groups the dialogues into three categories on the basis of the order in which Plato composed them.  Plato begins his career, so the narrative goes, representing his teacher Socrates in typically short conversations about ethics, virtue, and the best human life.  These are “early” dialogues.  Only subsequently does Plato develop his own philosophical views—the most famous of which is the doctrine of the Forms or Ideas—that Socrates defends.  These “middle” dialogues put forth positive doctrines that are generally thought to be Platonic and not Socratic. Finally, towards the end of his life, Plato composes dialogues in which Socrates typically either hardly features at all or is altogether absent.  These are the “late” dialogues.

There are a number of complications with this interpretive thesis, and many of them focus on the portrayal of Socrates.  Though the Gorgias is an early dialogue, Socrates concludes the dialogue with a myth that some scholars attribute to a Pythagorean influence on Plato that he would not have had during Socrates’ lifetime.  Though the Parmenides is a middle dialogue, the younger Socrates speaks only at the beginning before Parmenides alone speaks for the remainder of the dialogue.  While the Philebus is a late dialogue, Socrates is the main speaker.  Some scholars identify the Meno as an early dialogue because Socrates refutes Meno’s attempts to articulate the nature of virtue.  Others, focusing on Socrates’ use of the theory of recollection and the method of hypothesis, argue that it is a middle dialogue.  Finally, while Plato’s most famous work the Republic is a middle dialogue, some scholars make a distinction within the Republic itself.  The first book, they argue, is Socratic, because in it we find Socrates refuting Thrasymachus’ definition of justice while maintaining that he knows nothing about justice.  The rest of the dialogue they claim, with its emphasis on the division of the soul and the metaphysics of the Forms, is Platonic.

To discern a consistent Socrates in Plato is therefore a difficult task.  Instead of speaking about chronology of composition, contemporary scholars searching for views that are likely to have been associated with the historical Socrates generally focus on a group of dialogues that are united by topical similarity.  These “Socratic dialogues” feature Socrates as the principal speaker, challenging his interlocutor to elaborate on and critically examine his own views while typically not putting forth substantive claims of his own.  These dialogues—including those that some scholars think are not written by Plato and those that most scholars agree are not written by Plato but that Thrasyllus included in his collection—are as follows: Euthyphro, Apology, Crito, Alcibiades I, Alcibiades II, Hipparchus, Rival Lovers, Theages, Charmides, Laches, Lysis, Euthydemus, Protagoras, Gorgias, Meno, Greater Hippias, Lesser Hippias, Ion, Menexenus, Clitophon, Minos.  Some of the more famous positions Socrates defends in these dialogues are covered in the content section.

v. Aristotle

Aristotle was born in 384 B.C.E., fifteen 15 years after the death of Socrates.  At the age of eighteen, he went to study at Plato’s Academy, and remained there for twenty years.  Afterwards, he traveled throughout Asia and was invited by Phillip II of Macedon to tutor his son Alexander, known to history as Alexander the Great.  While Aristotle would never have had the chance to meet Socrates, we have in his writings an account of both Socrates’ method and the topics about which he had conversations.  Given the likelihood that Aristotle heard about Socrates from Plato and those at his Academy, it is not surprising that most of what he says about Socrates follows the depiction of him in the Platonic dialogues.

Aristotle related four concrete points about Socrates.  The first is that Socrates asked questions without supplying an answer of his own, because he claimed to know nothing (De Elenchis Sophisticus 1836b6-8).  The picture of Socrates here is consistent with that of Plato’s Apology.  Second, Aristotle claims that Socrates never asked questions about nature, but concerned himself only with ethical questions.  Aristotle thus attributes to the historical Socrates both the method and topics we find in Plato’s Socratic dialogues.

Third, Aristotle claims that Socrates is the first to have employed epagōgē, a word typically rendered in English as “induction.”  This translation, however, is misleading, lest we impute to Socrates a preference for inductive reasoning as opposed to deductive reasoning.  The term better indicates that Socrates was fond or arguing via the use of analogy.  For instance, just as a doctor does not practice medicine for himself but for the best interest of his patient, so the ruler in the city takes no account of his own personal profit, but is rather interested in caring for his citizens (Republic 342d-e).

The fourth and final claim Aristotle makes about Socrates itself has two parts.  First, Socrates was the first to ask the question, ti esti: what is it?  For example, if someone were to suggest to Socrates that our children should grow up to be courageous, he would ask, what is courage?  That is, what is the universal definition or nature that holds for all examples of courage?  Second, as distinguished from Plato, Socrates did not separate universals from their particular instantiations.  For Plato, the noetic object, the knowable thing, is the separate universal, not the particular.  Socrates simply asked the “what is it” question (on this and the previous two points, see Metaphysics I.6.987a29-b14; cf. b22-24, b27-33, and see XIII.4.1078b12-34).

2. Content: What does Socrates Think?

Given the nature of these sources, the task of recounting what Socrates thought is not an easy one.  Nonetheless, reading Plato’s Apology, it is possible to articulate a number of what scholars today typically associate with Socrates.  Plato the author has his Socrates claim that Plato was present in the courtroom for Socrates’ defense (Apology 34a), and while this cannot mean that Plato records the defense as a word for word transcription, it is the closest thing we have to an account of what Socrates actually said at a concrete point in his life.

a. Presocratic Philosophy and the Sophists

Socrates opens his defense speech by defending himself against his older accusers (Apology 18a), claiming they have poisoned the minds of his jurors since they were all young men.  Amongst these accusers was Aristophanes.  In addition to the claim that Socrates makes the worse argument into the stronger, there is a rumor that Socrates idles the day away talking about things in the sky and below the earth.  His reply is that he never discusses such topics (Apology 18a-c).  Socrates is distinguishing himself here not just from the sophists and their alleged ability to invert the strength of arguments, but from those we have now come to call the Presocratic philosophers.

The Presocratics were not just those who came before Socrates, for there are some Presocratic philosophers who were his contemporaries.  The term is sometimes used to suggest that, while Socrates cared about ethics, the Presocratic philosophers did not.  This is misleading, for we have evidence that a number of Presocratics explored ethical issues.  The term is best used to refer to the group of thinkers whom Socrates did not influence and whose fundamental uniting characteristic was that they sought to explain the world in terms of its own inherent principles.  The 6th cn. Milesian Thales, for instance, believed that the fundamental principle of all things was water.  Anaximander believed the principle was the indefinite (apeiron), and for Anaxamines it was air.  Later in Plato’s Apology (26d-e), Socrates rhetorically asks whether Meletus thinks he is prosecuting Anaxagoras, the 5th cn. thinker who argued that the universe was originally a mixture of elements that have since been set in motion by Nous, or Mind.  Socrates suggests that he does not engage in the same sort of cosmological inquiries that were the main focus of many Presocratics.

The other group against which Socrates compares himself is the Sophists, learned men who travelled from city to city offering to teach the youth for a fee.  While he claims he thinks it an admirable thing to teach as Gorgias, Prodicus, or Hippias claim they can (Apology 20a), he argues that he himself does not have knowledge of human excellence or virtue (Apology 20b-c).  Though Socrates inquires after the nature of virtue, he does not claim to know it, and certainly does not ask to be paid for his conversations.

b. Socratic Themes in Plato’s Apology

i. Socratic Ignorance

Plato’s Socrates moves next to explain the reason he has acquired the reputation he has and why so many citizens dislike him.  The oracle at Delphi told Socrates’ friend Chaerephon, “no one is wiser than Socrates” (Apology 21a).  Socrates explains that he was not aware of any wisdom he had, and so set out to find someone who had wisdom in order to demonstrate that the oracle was mistaken.  He first went to the politicians but found them lacking wisdom.  He next visited the poets and found that, though they spoke in beautiful verses, they did so through divine inspiration, not because they had wisdom of any kind.  Finally, Socrates found that the craftsmen had knowledge of their own craft, but that they subsequently believed themselves to know much more than they actually did.  Socrates concluded that he was better off than his fellow citizens because, while they thought they knew something and did not, he was aware of his own ignorance.  The god who speaks through the oracle, he says, is truly wise, whereas human wisdom is worth little or nothing (Apology 23a).

This awareness of one’s own absence of knowledge is what is known as Socratic ignorance, and it is arguably the thing for which Socrates is most famous.  Socratic ignorance is sometimes called simple ignorance, to be distinguished from the double ignorance of the citizens with whom Socrates spoke.  Simple ignorance is being aware of one’s own ignorance, whereas double ignorance is not being aware of one’s ignorance while thinking that one knows.  In showing many influential figures in Athens that they did not know what they thought they did, Socrates came to be despised in many circles.

It is worth nothing that Socrates does not claim here that he knows nothing.  He claims that he is aware of his ignorance and that whatever it is that he does know is worthless.  Socrates has a number of strong convictions about what makes for an ethical life, though he cannot articulate precisely why these convictions are true.  He believes for instance that it is never just to harm anyone, whether friend or enemy, but he does not, at least in Book I of the Republic, offer a systematic account of the nature of justice that could demonstrate why this is true.  Because of his insistence on repeated inquiry, Socrates has refined his convictions such that he can both hold particular views about justice while maintaining that he does not know the complete nature of justice.

We can see this contrast quite clearly in Socrates’ cross-examination of his accuser Meletus.  Because he is charged with corrupting the youth, Socrates inquires after who it is that helps the youth (Apology, 24d-25a).  In the same way that we take a horse to a horse trainer to improve it, Socrates wants to know the person to whom we take a young person to educate him and improve him.  Meletus’ silence condemns him: he has never bothered to reflect on such matters, and therefore is unaware of his ignorance about matters that are the foundation of his own accusation (Apology 25b-c).  Whether or not Socrates—or Plato for that matter—actually thinks it is possible to achieve expertise in virtue is a subject on which scholars disagree.

ii. Priority of the Care of the Soul

Throughout his defense speech (Apology 20a-b, 24c-25c, 31b, 32d, 36c, 39d) Socrates repeatedly stresses that a human being must care for his soul more than anything else (see also Crito 46c-47d, Euthyphro 13b-c, Gorgias 520a4ff).  Socrates found that his fellow citizens cared more for wealth, reputation, and their bodies while neglecting their souls (Apology 29d-30b).  He believed that his mission from the god was to examine his fellow citizens and persuade them that the most important good for a human being was the health of the soul. Wealth, he insisted, does not bring about human excellence or virtue, but virtue makes wealth and everything else good for human beings (Apology 30b).

Socrates believes that his mission of caring for souls extends to the entirety of the city of Athens.  He argues that the god gave him to the city as a gift and that his mission is to help improve the city.  He thus attempts to show that he is not guilty of impiety precisely because everything he does is in response to the oracle and at the service of the god.  Socrates characterizes himself as a gadfly and the city as a sluggish horse in need of stirring up (Apology 30e).  Without philosophical inquiry, the democracy becomes stagnant and complacent, in danger of harming itself and others.  Just as the gadfly is an irritant to the horse but rouses it to action, so Socrates supposes that his purpose is to agitate those around him so that they begin to examine themselves.  One might compare this claim with Socrates’ assertion in the Gorgias that, while his contemporaries aim at gratification, he practices the true political craft because he aims at what is best (521d-e).  Such comments, in addition to the historical evidence that we have, are Socrates’ strongest defense that he is not only not a burden to the democracy but a great asset to it.

iii. The Unexamined Life

After the jury has convicted Socrates and sentenced him to death, he makes one of the most famous proclamations in the history of philosophy.  He tells the jury that he could never keep silent, because “the unexamined life is not worth living for human beings” (Apology 38a).  We find here Socrates’ insistence that we are all called to reflect upon what we believe, account for what we know and do not known, and generally speaking to seek out, live in accordance with, and defend those views that make for a well lived and meaningful life.

Some scholars call attention to Socrates’ emphasis on human nature here, and argue that the call to live examined lives follows from our nature as human beings.  We are naturally directed by pleasure and pain.  We are drawn to power, wealth and reputation, the sorts of values to which Athenians were drawn as well.  Socrates’ call to live examined lives is not necessarily an insistence to reject all such motivations and inclinations but rather an injunction to appraise their true worth for the human soul.  The purpose of the examined life is to reflect upon our everyday motivations and values and to subsequently inquire into what real worth, if any, they have.  If they have no value or indeed are even harmful, it is upon us to pursue those things that are truly valuable.

One can see in reading the Apology that Socrates examines the lives of his jurors during his own trial.  By asserting the primacy of the examined life after he has been convicted and sentenced to death, Socrates, the prosecuted, becomes the prosecutor, surreptitiously accusing those who convicted him of not living a life that respects their own humanity.  He tells them that by killing him they will not escape examining their lives.  To escape giving an account of one’s life is neither possible nor good, Socrates claims, but it is best to prepare oneself to be as good as possible (Apology 39d-e).

We find here a conception of a well-lived life that differs from one that would likely be supported by many contemporary philosophers.  Today, most philosophers would argue that we must live ethical lives (though what this means is of course a matter of debate) but that it is not necessary for everyone to engage in the sort of discussions Socrates had everyday, nor must one do so in order to be considered a good person.  A good person, we might say, lives a good life insofar as he does what is just, but he does not necessarily need to be consistently engaged in debates about the nature of justice or the purpose of the state.  No doubt Socrates would disagree, not just because the law might be unjust or the state might do too much or too little, but because, insofar as we are human beings, self-examination is always beneficial to us.

c. Other Socratic Positions and Arguments

In addition to the themes one finds in the Apology, the following are a number of other positions in the Platonic corpus that are typically considered Socratic.

i. Unity of Virtue; All Virtue is Knowledge

In the Protagoras (329b-333b) Socrates argues for the view that all of the virtues—justice, wisdom, courage, piety, and so forth—are one.  He provides a number of arguments for this thesis.  For example, while it is typical to think that one can be wise without being temperate, Socrates rejects this possibility on the grounds that wisdom and temperance both have the same opposite: folly.  Were they truly distinct, they would each have their own opposites.  As it stands, the identity of their opposites indicates that one cannot possess wisdom without temperance and vice versa.

This thesis is sometimes paired with another Socratic, view, that is, that virtue is a form of knowledge (Meno 87e-89a; cf. Euthydemus 278d-282a).  Things like beauty, strength, and health benefit human beings, but can also harm them if they are not accompanied by knowledge or wisdom.  If virtue is to be beneficial it must be knowledge, since all the qualities of the soul are in themselves neither beneficial not harmful, but are only beneficial when accompanied by wisdom and harmful when accompanied by folly.

ii. No One Errs Knowingly/No One Errs Willingly

Socrates famously declares that no one errs or makes mistakes knowingly (Protagoras 352c, 358b-b).  Here we find an example of Socrates’ intellectualism.  When a person does what is wrong, their failure to do what is right is an intellectual error, or due to their own ignorance about what is right.  If the person knew what was right, he would have done it.  Hence, it is not possible for someone simultaneously know what is right and do what is wrong.  If someone does what is wrong, they do so because they do not know what is right, and if they claim the have known what was right at the time when they committed the wrong, they are mistaken, for had they truly known what was right, they would have done it.

Socrates therefore denies the possibility of akrasia, or weakness of the will.  No one errs willingly (Protagoras 345c4-e6).  While it might seem that Socrates is equivocating between knowingly and willingly, a look at Gorgias 466a-468e helps clarify his thesis.  Tyrants and orators, Socrates tells Polus, have the least power of any member of the city because they do not do what they want.  What they do is not good or beneficial even though human beings only want what is good or beneficial.  The tyrant’s will, corrupted by ignorance, is in such a state that what follows from it will necessarily harm him.  Conversely, the will that is purified by knowledge is in such a state that what follows from it will necessarily be beneficial.

iii. All Desire is for the Good

One of the premises of the argument just mentioned is that human beings only desire the good.  When a person does something for the sake of something else, it is always the thing for the sake of which he is acting that he wants.  All bad things or intermediate things are done not for themselves but for the sake of something else that is good.  When a tyrant puts someone to death, for instance, he does this because he thinks it is beneficial in some way.  Hence his action is directed towards the good because this is what he truly wants (Gorgias 467c-468b).

A similar version of this argument is in the Meno, 77b-78b.  Those that desire bad things do not know that they are truly bad; otherwise, they would not desire them.  They do not naturally desire what is bad but rather desire those things that they believe to be good but that are in fact bad.  They desire good things even though they lack knowledge of what is actually good.

iv. It is Better to Suffer an Injustice Than to Commit One

Socrates infuriates Polus with the argument that it is better to suffer an injustice than commit one (Gorgias 475a-d).  Polus agrees that it is more shameful to commit an injustice, but maintains it is not worse.  The worst thing, in his view, is to suffer injustice.  Socrates argues that, if something is more shameful, it surpasses in either badness or pain or both.  Since committing an injustice is not more painful than suffering one, committing an injustice cannot surpass in pain or both pain and badness.  Committing an injustice surpasses suffering an injustice in badness; differently stated, committing an injustice is worse than suffering one.  Therefore, given the choice between the two, we should choose to suffer rather than commit an injustice.

This argument must be understood in terms of the Socratic emphasis on the care of the soul.  Committing an injustice corrupts one’s soul, and therefore committing injustice is the worst thing a person can do to himself (cf. Crito 47d-48a, Republic I 353d-354a).  If one commits injustice, Socrates goes so far as to claim that it is better to seek punishment than avoid it on the grounds that the punishment will purge or purify the soul of its corruption (Gorgias 476d-478e).

v. Eudaimonism

The Greek word for happiness is eudaimonia, which signifies not merely feeling a certain way but being a certain way.  A different way of translating eudaimonia is well-being.  Many scholars believe that Socrates holds two related but not equivalent principles regarding eudaimonia: first, that it is rationally required that a person make his own happiness the foundational consideration for his actions, and second, that each person does in fact pursue happiness as the foundational consideration for his actions.  In relation to Socrates’ emphasis on virtue, it is not entirely clear what that means.  Virtue could be identical to happiness—in which case there is no difference between the two and if I am virtuous I am by definition happy—virtue could be a part of happiness—in which case if I am virtuous I will be happy although I could be made happier by the addition of other goods—or virtue could be instrumental for happiness—in which case if I am virtuous I might be happy (and I couldn’t be happy without virtue), but there is no guarantee that I will be happy.

There are a number of passages in the Apology that seem to indicate that the greatest good for a human being is having philosophical conversation (36b-d, 37e-38a, 40e-41c). Meno 87c-89a suggests that knowledge of the good guides the soul toward happiness (cf. Euthydemus 278e-282a).  And at Gorgias 507a-c Socrates suggests that the virtuous person, acting in accordance with wisdom, attains happiness (cf. Gorgias 478c-e: the happiest person has no badness in his soul).

vi. Ruling is An Expertise

Socrates is committed to the theme that ruling is a kind of craft or art (technē).  As such, it requires knowledge.  Just as a doctor brings about a desired result for his patient—health, for instance—so the ruler should bring about some desired result in his subject (Republic 341c-d, 342c).  Medicine, insofar as it has the best interest of its patient in mind, never seeks to benefit the practitioner.  Similarly, the ruler’s job is to act not for his own benefit but for the benefit of the citizens of the political community.  This is not to say that there might not be some contingent benefit that accrues to the practitioner; the doctor, for instance, might earn a fine salary.  But this benefit is not intrinsic to the expertise of medicine as such.  One could easily conceive of a doctor that makes very little money.  One cannot, however, conceive of a doctor that does not act on behalf of his patient.  Analogously, ruling is always for the sake of the ruled citizen, and justice, contra the famous claim from Thrasymachus, is not whatever is in the interest of the ruling power (Republic 338c-339a).

d. Socrates the Ironist

The suspicion that Socrates is an ironist can mean a number of things: on the one hand, it can indicate that Socrates is saying something with the intent to convey the opposite meaning.  Some readers for instance, including a number in the ancient world, understood Socrates’ avowal of ignorance in precisely this way.  Many have interpreted Socrates’ praise of Euthyphro, in which he claims that he can learn from him and will become his pupil, as an example of this sort of irony (Euthyphro 5a-b).  On the other hand, the Greek word eirōneia was understood to carry with it a sense of subterfuge, rendering the sense of the word something like masking with the intent to deceive.

Additionally, there are a number of related questions about Socrates’ irony.   Is the interlocutor supposed to be aware of the irony, or is he ignorant of it?  Is it the job of the reader to discern the irony?  Is the purpose of irony rhetorical, intended to maintain Socrates’ position as the director of the conversation, or pedagogical, meant to encourage the interlocutor to learn something?  Could it be both?

Scholars disagree on the sense in which we ought to call Socrates ironic.  When Socrates asks Callicles to tell him what he means by the stronger and to go easy on him so that he might learn better, Callicles claims he is being ironic (Gorgias 489e).  Thrasymachus accuses Socrates of being ironic insofar as he pretends he does not have an account of justice, when he is actually hiding what he truly thinks (Republic 337a).  And though the Symposium is generally not thought to be a “Socratic” dialogue, we there find Alcibiades accusing Socrates of being ironic insofar as he acts like he is interested in him but then deny his advances (Symposium 216e, 218d).  It is not clear which kind of irony is at work with these examples.

Aristotle defines irony as an attempt at self-deprecation (Nicomachean Ethics 4.7, 1127b23-26).  He argues that self-deprecation is the opposite of boastfulness, and people that engage in this sort of irony do so to avoid pompousness and make their characters more attractive.  Above all, such people disclaim things that bring reputation.  On this reading, Socrates was prone to understatement.

There are some thinkers for whom Socratic irony is not just restricted to what Socrates says.  The 19th century Danish philosopher Søren Kierkegaard held the view that Socrates himself, his character, is ironic.  The 20th century philosopher Leo Strauss defined irony as the noble dissimulation of one’s worth.  On this reading, Socrates’ irony consisted in his refusal to display his superiority in front of his inferiors so that his message would be understood only by the privileged few.  As such, Socratic irony is intended to conceal Socrates’ true message.

3. Method: How Did Socrates Do Philosophy?

As famous as the Socratic themes are, the Socratic method is equally famous.  Socrates conducted his philosophical activity by means of question an answer, and we typically associate with him a method called the elenchus.  At the same time, Plato’s Socrates calls himself a midwife—who has no ideas of his own but helps give birth to the ideas of others—and proceeds dialectically—defined either as asking questions, embracing the practice of collection and division, or proceeding from hypotheses to first principles.

a. The Elenchus: Socrates the Refuter

A typical Socratic elenchus is a cross-examination of a particular position, proposition, or definition, in which Socrates tests what his interlocutor says and refutes it.  There is, however, great debate amongst scholars regarding not only what is being refuted but also whether or not the elenchus can prove anything.  There are questions, in other words, about the topic of the elenchus and its purpose or goal.

i. Topic

Socrates typically begins his elenchus with the question, “what is it”?  What is piety, he asks Euthyphro.  Euthyphro appears to give five separate definitions of piety: piety is proceeding against whomever does injustice (5d-6e), piety is what is loved by the gods (6e-7a), piety is what is loved by all the gods (9e), the godly and the pious is the part of the just that is concerned with the care of the gods (12e), and piety is the knowledge of sacrificing and praying (13d-14a).  For some commentators, what Socrates is searching for here is a definition.  Other commentators argue that Socrates is searching for more than just the definition of piety but seeks a comprehensive account of the nature of piety.  Whatever the case, Socrates refutes the answer given to him in response to the ‘what is it’ question.

Another reading of the Socratic elenchus is that Socrates is not just concerned with the reply of the interlocutor but is concerned with the interlocutor himself.  According to this view, Socrates is as much concerned with the truth or falsity of propositions as he is with the refinement of the interlocutor’s way of life.  Socrates is concerned with both epistemological and moral advances for the interlocutor and himself.  It is not propositions or replies alone that are refuted, for Socrates does not conceive of them dwelling in isolation from those that hold them.  Thus conceived, the elenchus refutes the person holding a particular view, not just the view.  For instance, Socrates shames Thrasymachus when he shows him that he cannot maintain his view that justice is ignorance and injustice is wisdom (Republic I 350d).  The elenchus demonstrates that Thrasymachus cannot consistently maintain all his claims about the nature of justice.  This view is consistent with a view we find in Plato’s late dialogue called the Sophist, in which the Visitor from Elea, not Socrates, claims that the soul will not get any advantage from learning that it is offered to it until someone shames it by refuting it (230b-d).

ii. Purpose

In terms of goal, there are two common interpretations of the elenchus.  Both have been developed by scholars in response to what Gregory Vlastos called the problem of the Socratic elenchus.  The problem is how Socrates can claim that position W is false, when the only thing he has established is its inconsistency with other premises whose truth he has not tried to establish in the elenchus.

The first response is what is called the constructivist position.  A constructivist argues that the elenchus establishes the truth or falsity of individual answers.  The elenchus on this interpretation can and does have positive results.  Vlastos himself argued that Socrates not only established the inconsistency of the interlocutor’s beliefs by showing their inconsistency, but that Socrates’ own moral beliefs were always consistent, able to withstand the test of the elenchus.  Socrates could therefore pick out a faulty premise in his elenctic exchange with an interlocutor, and sought to replace the interlocutor’s false beliefs with his own.

The second response is called the non-constructivist position.  This position claims that Socrates does not think the elenchus can establish the truth or falsity of individual answers.  The non-constructivist argues that all the elenchus can show is the inconsistency of W with the premises X, Y, and Z.  It cannot establish that ~W is the case, or for that matter replace any of the premises with another, for this would require a separate argument.  The elenchus establishes the falsity of the conjunction of W, X, Y, and Z, but not the truth or falsity of any of those premises individually.  The purpose of the elenchus on this interpretation is to show the interlocutor that he is confused, and, according to some scholars, to use that confusion as a stepping stone on the way to establishing a more consistent, well-formed set of beliefs.

b. Maieutic: Socrates the Midwife

In Plato’s Theaetetus Socrates identifies himself as a midwife (150b-151b).  While the dialogue is not generally considered Socratic, it is elenctic insofar as it tests and refutes Theaetetus’ definitions of knowledge.  It also ends without a conclusive answer to its question, a characteristic it shares with a number of Socratic dialogues.

Socrates tells Theaetetus that his mother Phaenarete was a midwife (149a) and that he himself is an intellectual midwife.  Whereas the craft of midwifery (150b-151d) brings on labor pains or relieves them in order to help a woman deliver a child, Socrates does not watch over the body but over the soul, and helps his interlocutor give birth to an idea.  He then applies the elenchus to test whether or not the intellectual offspring is a phantom or a fertile truth.  Socrates stresses that both he and actual midwives are barren, and cannot give birth to their own offspring.  In spite of his own emptiness of ideas, Socrates claims to be skilled at bringing forth the ideas of others and examining them.

c. Dialectic: Socrates the Constructer

The method of dialectic is thought to be more Platonic than Socratic, though one can understand why many have associated it with Socrates himself.  For one thing, the Greek dialegesthai ordinarily means simply “to converse” or “to discuss.”  Hence when Socrates is distinguishing this sort of discussion from rhetorical exposition in the Gorgias, the contrast seems to indicate his preference for short questions and answers as opposed to longer speeches (447b-c, 448d-449c).

There are two other definitions of dialectic in the Platonic corpus.  First, in the Republic, Socrates distinguishes between dianoetic thinking, which makes use of the senses and assumes hypotheses, and dialectical thinking, which does not use the senses and goes beyond hypotheses to first principles (Republic VII 510c-511c, 531d-535a).  Second, in the Phaedrus, Sophist, Statesman, and Philebus, dialectic is defined as a method of collection and division.  One collects things that are scattered into one kind and also divides each kind according to its species (Phaedrus 265d-266c).

Some scholars view the elenchus and dialectic as fundamentally different methods with different goals, while others view them as consistent and reconcilable.  Some even view them as two parts of one argument procedure, in which the elenchus refutes and dialectic constructs.

4. Legacy: How Have Other Philosophers Understood Socrates?

Nearly every school of philosophy in antiquity had something positive to say about Socrates, and most of them drew their inspiration from him.  Socrates also appears in the works of many famous modern philosophers.  Immanuel Kant, the 18th century German philosopher best known for the categorical imperative, hailed Socrates, amongst other ancient philosophers, as someone who didn’t just speculate but who lived philosophically.  One of the more famous quotes about Socrates is from John Stuart Mill, the 19th century utilitarian philosopher who claimed that it is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied.  The following is but a brief survey of Socrates as he is treated in philosophical thinking that emerges after the death of Aristotle in 322 B.C.E.

a. Hellenistic Philosophy

i. The Cynics

The Cynics greatly admired Socrates, and traced their philosophical lineage back to him.  One of the first representatives of the Socratic legacy was the Cynic Diogenes of Sinope.  No genuine writings of Diogenes have survived and most of our evidence about him is anecdotal.  Nevertheless, scholars attribute a number of doctrines to him.  He sought to undermine convention as a foundation for ethical values and replace it with nature.  He understood the essence of human being to be rational, and defined happiness as freedom and self-mastery, an objective readily accessible to those who trained the body and mind.

ii. The Stoics

There is a biographical story according to which Zeno, the founder of the Stoic school and not the Zeno of Zeno's Paradoxes, became interested in philosophy by reading and inquiring about Socrates.  The Stoics took themselves to be authentically Socratic, especially in defending the unqualified restriction of ethical goodness to ethical excellence, the conception of ethical excellence as a kind of knowledge, a life not requiring any bodily or external advantage nor ruined by any bodily disadvantage, and the necessity and sufficiency of ethical excellence for complete happiness.

Zeno is known for his characterization of the human good as a smooth flow of life.  Stoics were therefore attracted to the Socratic elenchus because it could expose inconsistencies—both social and psychological—that disrupted one’s life.  In the absence of justification for a specific action or belief, one would not be in harmony with oneself, and therefore would not live well.  On the other hand, if one held a position that survived cross-examination, such a position would be consistent and coherent.  The Socratic elenchus was thus not just an important social and psychological test, but also an epistemological one.  The Stoics held that knowledge was a coherent set of psychological attitudes, and therefore a person holding attitudes that could withstand the elenchus could be said to have knowledge.  Those with inconsistent or incoherent psychological commitments were thought to be ignorant.

Socrates also figures in Roman Stoicism, particularly in the works of Seneca and Epictetus.  Both men admired Socrates’ strength of character.  Seneca praises Socrates for his ability to remain consistent unto himself in the face of the threat posed by the Thirty Tyrants, and also highlights the Socratic focus on caring for oneself instead of fleeing oneself and seeking fulfillment by external means.  Epictetus, when offering advice about holding to one’s own moral laws as inviolable maxims, claims, “though you are not yet a Socrates, you ought, however, to live as one desirous of becoming a Socrates” (Enchiridion 50).

One aspect of Socrates to which Epictetus was particularly attracted was the elenchus.  Though his understanding of the process is in some ways different from Socrates’, throughout his Discourses Epictetus repeatedly stresses the importance of recognition of one’s ignorance (2.17.1) and awareness of one’s own impotence regarding essentials (2.11.1).  He characterizes Socrates as divinely appointed to hold the elenctic position (3.21.19) and associates this role with Socrates’ protreptic expertise (2.26.4-7).  Epictetus encouraged his followers to practice the elenchus on themselves, and claims that Socrates did precisely this on account of his concern with self-examination (2.1.32-3).

iii. The Skeptics

Broadly speaking, skepticism is the view that we ought to be either suspicious of claims to epistemological truth or at least withhold judgment from affirming absolute claims to knowledge.  Amongst Pyrrhonian skeptics, Socrates appears at times like a dogmatist and at other times like a skeptic or inquirer.  On the one hand, Sextus Empiricus lists Socrates as a thinker who accepts the existence of god (Against the Physicists, I.9.64) and then recounts the cosmological argument that Xenophon attributes to Socrates (Against the Physicists, I.9.92-4).  On the other hand, in arguing that human being is impossible to conceive, Sextus Empiricus cites Socrates as unsure whether or not he is a human being or something else (Outlines of Pyrrhonism 2.22).  Socrates is also said to have remained in doubt about this question (Against the Professors 7.264).

Academic skeptics grounded their position that nothing can be known in Socrates’ admission of ignorance in the Apology (Cicero, On the Orator 3.67, Academics 1.44).  Arcesilaus, the first head of the Academy to take it toward a skeptical turn, picked up from Socrates the procedure of arguing, first asking others to give their positions and then refuting them (Cicero, On Ends 2.2, On the Orator 3.67, On the Nature of the Gods 1.11).  While the Academy would eventually move away from skepticism, Cicero, speaking on behalf of the Academy of Philo, makes the claim that Socrates should be understood as endorsing the claim that nothing, other than one’s own ignorance, could be known (Academics 2.74).

iv. The Epicurean

The Epicureans were one of the few schools that criticized Socrates, though many scholars think that this was in part because of their animus toward their Stoic counterparts, who admired him.  In general, Socrates is depicted in Epicurean writings as a sophist, rhetorician, and skeptic who ignored natural science for the sake of ethical inquiries that concluded without answers.  Colotes criticizes Socrates’ statement in the Phaedrus (230a) that he does not know himself (Plutarch, Against Colotes 21 1119b), and Philodemus attacks Socrates’ argument in the Protagoras (319d) that virtue cannot be taught (Rhetoric I 261, 8ff).

The Epicureans wrote a number of books against several of Plato’s Socratic dialogues, including the Lysis, Euthydemus, and Gorgias.  In the Gorgias we find Socrates suspicious of the view that pleasure is intrinsically worthy and his insistence that pleasure is not the equivalent of the good (Gorgias 495b-499b).  In defining pleasure as freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) and defining this sort of pleasure as the sole good for human beings, the Epicureans shared little with the unbridled hedonism Socrates criticizes Callicles for embracing.  Indeed, in the Letter to Menoeceus, Epicurus explicitly argues against pursuing this sort of pleasure (131-132).  Nonetheless, the Epicureans did equate pleasure with the good, and the view that pleasure is not the equivalent of the good could not have endeared Socrates to their sentiment.

Another reason for the Epicurean refusal to praise Socrates or make him a cornerstone of their tradition was his perceived irony.  According to Cicero, Epicurus was opposed to Socrates’ representing himself as ignorant while simultaneously praising others like Protagoras, Hippias, Prodicus, and Gorgias (Rhetoric, Vol. II, Brutus 292).  This irony for the Epicureans was pedagogically pointless: if Socrates had something to say, he should have said it instead of hiding it.

v. The Peripatetics

Aristotle’s followers, the Peripatetics, either said little about Socrates or were pointedly vicious in their attacks.  Amongst other things, the Peripatetics accused Socrates of being a bigamist, a charge that appears to have gained so much traction that the Stoic Panaetius wrote a refutation of it (Plutarch, Aristides 335c-d).  The general peripatetic criticism of Socrates, similar in one way to the Epicureans, was that he concentrated solely on ethics, and that this was an unacceptable ideal for the philosophical life.

b. Modern Philosophy

i. Hegel

In Socrates, Hegel found what he called the great historic turning point (Philosophy of History, 448).  With Socrates, Hegel claims, two opposed rights came into collision: the individual consciousness and the universal law of the state.  Prior to Socrates, morality for the ancients was present but it was not present Socratically.  That is, the good was present as a universal, without its having had the form of the conviction of the individual in his consciousness (407).  Morality was present as an immediate absolute, directing the lives of citizens without their having reflected upon it and deliberated about it for themselves.  The law of the state, Hegel claims, had authority as the law of the gods, and thus had a universal validity that was recognized by all (408).

In Hegel’s view the coming of Socrates signals a shift in the relationship between the individual and morality.  The immediate now had to justify itself to the individual consciousness.  Hegel thus not only ascribes to Socrates the habit of asking questions about what one should do but also about the actions that the state has prescribed.  With Socrates, consciousness is turned back within itself and demands that the law should establish itself before consciousness, internal to it, not merely outside it (408-410).   Hegel attributes to Socrates a reflective questioning that is skeptical, which moves the individual away from unreflective obedience and into reflective inquiry about the ethical standards of one’s community.

Generally, Hegel finds in Socrates a skepticism that renders ordinary or immediate knowledge confused and insecure, in need of reflective certainty which only consciousness can bring (370).  Though he attributes to the sophists the same general skeptical comportment, in Socrates Hegel locates human subjectivity at a higher level.  With Socrates and onward we have the world raising itself to the level of conscious thought and becoming object for thought.  The question as to what Nature is gives way to the question about what Truth is, and the question about the relationship of self-conscious thought to real essence becomes the predominant philosophical issue (450-1).

ii. Kierkegaard

Kierkegaard’s most well recognized views on Socrates are from his dissertation, The Concept of Irony With Continual Reference to Socrates.  There, he argues that Socrates is not the ethical figure that the history of philosophy has thought him to be, but rather an ironist in all that he does.  Socrates does not just speak ironically but is ironic.  Indeed, while most people have found Aristophanes’ portrayal of Socrates an obvious exaggeration and caricature, Kierkegaard goes so far as to claim that he came very close to the truth in his depiction of Socrates.  He rejects Hegel’s picture of Socrates ushering in a new era of philosophical reflection and instead argues that the limits of Socratic irony testified to the need for religious faith.  As opposed to the Hegelian view that Socratic irony was an instrument in the service of the development of self-consciousness, Kierkegaard claims that irony was Socrates’ position or comportment, and that he did not have any more than this to give.

Later in his writing career Kierkegaard comes to think that he has neglected Socrates’ significance as an ethical and religious figure.  In his final essay entitled My Task, Kierkegaard claims that his mission is a Socratic one; that is, in his task to reinvigorate a Christianity that remained the cultural norm but had, in Kierkegaard’s eyes, nearly ceased altogether to be practiced authentically, Kierkegaard conceives of himself as a kind of Christian Socrates, rousing Christians from their complacency to a conception of Christian faith as the highest, most passionate expression of individual subjectivity.  Kierkegaard therefore sees himself as a sort of Christian gadfly.  The Socratic call to become aware of one’s own ignorance finds its parallel in the Kierkegaardian call to recognize one’s own failing to truly live as a Christian.  The Socratic claim to ignorance—while Socrates is closer to knowledge than his contemporaries—is replaced by the Kierkegaard’s claim that he is not a Christian—though certainly more so than his own contemporaries.

iii. Nietzsche

Nietzsche’s most famous account of Socrates is his scathing portrayal in The Birth of Tragedy, in which Socrates and rational thinking lead to the emergence of an age of decadence in Athens.  The delicate balance in Greek culture between the Apollonian—order, calmness, self-control, restraint—and the Dionysian—chaos, revelry, self-forgetfulness, indulgence— initially represented on stage in the tragedies of Aeschylus and Sophocles, gave way to the rationalism of Euripides.  Euripides, Nietzsche argues, was only a mask for the newborn demon called Socrates (section 12).  Tragedy—and Greek culture more generally—was corrupted by “aesthetic Socratism”, whose supreme law, Nietzsche argues, was that ‘to be beautiful everything must be intelligible’.  Whereas the former sort of tragedy absorbed the spectator in the activities and sufferings of its chief characters, the emergence of Socrates heralded the onset of a new kind of tragedy in which this identification is obstructed by the spectators having to figure out the meaning and presuppositions of the characters’ suffering.

Nietzsche continues his attack on Socrates later in his career in Twilight of the Idols.  Socrates here represents the lowest class of people (section 3), and his irony consists in his being an exaggeration at the same time as he conceals himself (4).  He is the inventor of dialectic (5) which he wields mercilessly because, being an ugly plebeian, he had no other means of expressing himself (6) and therefore employed question and answer to render his opponent powerless (7).  Socrates turned dialectic into a new kind of contest (8), and because his instincts had turned against each other and were in anarchy (9), he established the rule of reason as a counter-tyrant in order not to perish (10).  Socrates’ decadence here consists in his having to fight his instincts (11).  He was thus profoundly anti-life, so much so that he wanted to die (12).

Nonetheless, while Nietzsche accuses Socrates of decadence, he nevertheless recognizes him as a powerful individual, which perhaps accounts for why we at times find in Nietzsche a hesitant admiration of Socrates.  He calls Socrates one of the very greatest instinctive forces (The Birth of Tragedy, section 13), labels him as a “free spirit” (Human, All Too Human I, 433) praises him as the first “philosopher of life” in his 17th lecture on the Preplatonics, and anoints him a ‘virtuoso of life’ in his notebooks from 1875.  Additionally, contra Twilight of the Idols, in Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Nietzsche speaks of a death in which one’s virtue still shines, and some commentators have seen in this a celebration of the way in which Socrates died.

iv. Heidegger

Heidegger finds in Socrates a kinship with his own view that the truth of philosophy lies in a certain way of seeing things, and thus is identical with a particular kind of method.  He attributes to Socrates the view that the truth of some subject matter shows itself not in some definition that is the object or end of a process of inquiry, but in the very process of inquiry itself.  Heidegger characterizes the Socratic method as a kind of productive negation: by refuting that which stands in front of it—in Socrates’ case, an interlocutor’s definition—it discloses the positive in the very process of questioning.  Socrates is not interested in articulating propositions about piety but rather concerned with persisting in a questioning relation to it that preserves its irreducible sameness.  Behind multiple examples of pious action is Piety, and yet Piety is not something that can be spoken of.  It is that which discloses itself through the process of silent interrogation.

It is precisely in his emphasis on silence that Heidegger diverges from Socrates.  Where Socrates insisted on the give and take of question and answer, Heideggerian questioning is not necessarily an inquiry into the views of others but rather an openness to the truth that one maintains without the need to speak.  To remain in dialogue with a given phenomenon is not the same thing as conversing about it, and true dialogue is always silent.

v. Gadamer

As Heidegger’s student, Gadamer shares his fundamental view that truth and method cannot be divorced in philosophy.  At the same time, his hermeneutics leads him to argue for the importance of dialectic as conversation.  Gadamer claims that whereas philosophical dialectic presents the whole truth by superceding all its partial propositions, hermeneutics too has the task of revealing a totality of meaning in all its relations.  The distinguishing characteristic of Gadamer’s hermeneutical dialectic is that it recognizes radical finitude: we are always already in an open-ended dialogical situation.  Conversation with the interlocutor is thus not a distraction that leads us away from seeing the truth but rather is the site of truth.  It is for this reason that Gadamer claims Plato communicated his philosophy only in dialogues: it was more than just an homage to Socrates, but was a reflection of his view that the word find its confirmation in another and in the agreement of another.

Gadamer also sees in the Socratic method an ethical way of being.  That is, he does not just think that Socrates converses about ethics but that repeated Socratic conversation is itself indicative of an ethical comportment.  On this account, Socrates knows the good not because he can give some final definition of it but rather because of his readiness to give an account of it.  The problem of not living an examined life is not that we might live without knowing what is ethical, but because without asking questions as Socrates does, we will not be ethical.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ahbel-Rappe, Sara, and Rachana Kamtekar (eds.), A Companion to Socrates (Oxford: Blackwell, 2006).
  • Arrowsmith, William, Lattimore, Richmond, and Parker, Douglass (trans.), Four Plays by Aristophanes: The Clouds, The Birds, Lysistrata, The Frogs (New York: Meridian, 1994).
  • Barnes, Jonathan, Complete Works of Aristotle vols. 1 & 2  (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Benson, Hugh H. (ed.), Essays on the Philosophy of Socrates (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • Brickhouse, Thomas C. & Smith, Nicholas D., Plato’s Socrates (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994).
  • Burkert, Walter, Greek Religion (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1985).
  • Cooper, John M., Plato: Collected Works (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1997).
  • Guthrie, W.K.C., Socrates (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1971).
  • Kahn, Charles H., Plato and the Socratic Dialogue (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Kraut, Richard (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Plato (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992).
  • Morrison, Donald R., The Cambridge Companion to Socrates (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012).
  • Rudebusch, George, Socrates (Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009).
  • Santas, Gerasimos, Socrates: Philosophy in Plato’s Early Dialogues (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979).
  • Taylor, C.C.W, 1998, Socrates (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socrates, Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).
  • Xenophon: Memorabilia. Oeconomicus. Symposium. Apologia. (Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1923).


Author Information

James M. Ambury
King’s College
U. S. A.

John Locke (1632—1704)

LockeJohn Locke was among the most famous philosophers and political theorists of the 17th century.  He is often regarded as the founder of a school of thought known as British Empiricism, and he made foundational contributions to modern theories of limited, liberal government. He was also influential in the areas of theology, religious toleration, and educational theory. In his most important work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke set out to offer an analysis of the human mind and its acquisition of knowledge. He offered an empiricist theory according to which we acquire ideas through our experience of the world. The mind is then able to examine, compare, and combine these ideas in numerous different ways. Knowledge consists of a special kind of relationship between different ideas. Locke’s emphasis on the philosophical examination of the human mind as a preliminary to the philosophical investigation of the world and its contents represented a new approach to philosophy, one which quickly gained a number of converts, especially in Great Britain. In addition to this broader project, the Essay contains a series of more focused discussions on important, and widely divergent, philosophical themes. In politics, Locke is best known as a proponent of limited government. He uses a theory of natural rights to argue that governments have obligations to their citizens, have only limited powers over their citizens, and can ultimately be overthrown by citizens under certain circumstances. He also provided powerful arguments in favor of religious toleration. This article attempts to give a broad overview of all key areas of Locke’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. The Main Project of the Essay
    1. Ideas
    2. The Critique of Nativism
    3. Idea Acquisition
    4. Language
    5. The Account of Knowledge
  3. Special Topics in the Essay
    1. Primary and Secondary Qualities
    2. Mechanism
    3. Volition and Agency
    4. Personhood and Personal Identity
    5. Real and Nominal Essences
    6. Religious Epistemology
  4. Political Philosophy
    1. The Two Treatises
    2. Property
    3. Toleration
  5. Theology
  6. Education
  7. Locke’s Influence
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Locke’s Works
    2. Recommended Reading

1. Life and Works

John Locke was born in 1632 in Wrington, a small village in southwestern England. His father, also named John, was a legal clerk and served with the Parliamentary forces in the English Civil War. His family was well-to-do, but not of particularly high social or economic standing. Locke spent his childhood in the West Country and as a teenager was sent to Westminster School in London.

Locke was successful at Westminster and earned a place at Christ Church, Oxford. He was to remain in Oxford from 1652 until 1667. Although he had little appreciation for the traditional scholastic philosophy he learned there, Locke was successful as a student and after completing his undergraduate degree he held a series of administrative and academic posts in the college. Some of Locke’s duties included instruction of undergraduates. One of his earliest substantive works, the Essays on the Law of Nature, was developed in the course of his teaching duties. Much of Locke’s intellectual effort and energy during his time at Oxford, especially during his later years there, was devoted to the study of medicine and natural philosophy (what we would now call science). Locke read widely in these fields, participated in various experiments, and became acquainted with Robert Boyle and many other notable natural philosophers. He also undertook the normal course of education and training to become a physician.

Locke left Oxford for London in 1667 where he became attached to the family of Anthony Ashley Cooper (then Lord Ashley, later the Earl of Shaftesbury). Locke may have played a number of roles in the household, mostly likely serving as tutor to Ashley’s son. In London, Locke continued to pursue his interests in medicine and natural philosophy. He formed a close working relationship with Thomas Sydenham, who later became one the most famous physicians of the age. He made a number of contacts within the newly formed Royal Society and became a member in 1668. He also acted as the personal physician to Lord Ashley. Indeed, on one occasion Locke participated in a very delicate surgical operation which Ashley credited with saving his life. Ashley was one of the most prominent English politicians at the time. Through his patronage Locke was able to hold a series of governmental posts. Most of his work related to policies in England’s American and Caribbean colonies. Most importantly, this was the period in Locke’s life when he began the project which would culminate in his most famous work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. The two earliest drafts of that work date from 1671. He was to continue work on this project intermittentlyfor nearly twenty years.

Locke travelled in France for several years starting in 1675. When he returned to England it was only to be for a few years. The political scene had changed greatly while Locke was away. Shaftesbury (as Ashley was now known) was out of favor and Locke’s association with him had become a liability. It was around this time that Locke composed his most famous political work, the Two Treatises Concerning Government. Although the Two Treatises would not be published until 1689 they show that he had already solidified his views on the nature and proper form of government. Following Shaftesbury’s death Locke fled to the Netherlands to escape political persecution. While there Locke travelled a great deal (sometimes for his own safety) and worked on two projects. First, he continued work on the Essay. Second, he wrote a work entitled Epistola de Tolerantia, which was published anonymously in 1689. Locke’s experiences in England, France, and the Netherlands convinced him that governments should be much more tolerant of religious diversity than was common at the time.

Following the Glorious Revolution of 1688-1689 Locke was able to return to England. He published both the Essay and the Two Treatises (the second anonymously) shortly after his return. He initially stayed in London but soon moved to the home of Francis and Damaris Masham in the small village of Oates, Essex. Damaris Masham, who was the daughter of a notable philosopher named Ralph Cudworth, had become acquainted with Locke several years before. The two formed a very close friendship which lasted until Locke’s death. During this period Locke kept busy working on politics, toleration, philosophy, economics, and educational theory.

Locke engaged in a number of controversies during his life, including a notable one with Jonas Proast over toleration. But Locke’s most famous and philosophically important controversy was with Edward Stillingfleet, the Bishop of Worcester. Stillingfleet, in addition to being a powerful political and theological figure, was an astute and forceful critic. The two men debated a number of the positions in the Essay in a series of published letters.

In his later years Locke devoted much of his attention to theology. His major work in this field was The Reasonableness of Christianity, published (again anonymously) in 1695. This work was controversial because Locke argued that many beliefs traditionally believed to be mandatory for Christians were unnecessary. Locke argued for a highly ecumenical form of Christianity. Closer to the time of his death Locke wrote a work on the Pauline Epistles. The work was unfinished, but published posthumously. A short work on miracles also dates from this time and was published posthumously.

Locke suffered from health problems for most of his adult life. In particular, he had respiratory ailments which were exacerbated by his visits to London where the air quality was very poor. His health took a turn for the worse in 1704 and he became increasingly debilitated. He died on 28 October 1704 while Damaris Masham was reading him the Psalms. He was buried at High Laver, near Oates. He wrote his own epitaph which was both humble and forthright.

2. The Main Project of the Essay

According to Locke’s own account the motivation for writing the Essay came to him while debating an unrelated topic with friends. He reports that they were able to make little headway on this topic and that they very quickly met with a number of confusions and difficulties. Locke realized that to make progress on this topic it was first necessary to examine something more fundamental: the human understanding. It was “necessary to examine our own Abilities, and see, what Objects our Understandings were, or were not fitted to deal with.” (Epistle, 7).

Locke’s insight was that before we can analyze the world and our access to it we have to know something about ourselves. We need to know how we acquire knowledge. We also need to know which areas of inquiry we are well suited to and which are epistemically closed to us, that is, which areas are such that we could not know them even in principle. We further need to know what knowledge consists in.  In keeping with these questions, at the very outset of the Essay Locke writes that it is his “Purpose enquire into the Original, Certainty, and Extent of humane Knowledge; together, with the Grounds and Degrees of Belief, Opinion, and Assent.” (1.1.2, 42). Locke thinks that it is only once we understand our cognitive capabilities that we can suitably direct our researches into the world. This may have been what Locke had in mind when he claimed that part of his ambition in the Essay was to be an “Under-Laborer” who cleared the ground and laid the foundations for the work of famous scientists like Robert Boyle and Isaac Newton.

The Essay is divided into four books with each book contributing to Locke’s overall goal of examining the human mind with respect to its contents and operations. In Book I Locke rules out one possible origin of our knowledge. He argues that our knowledge cannot have been innate. This sets up Book II in which Locke argues that all of our ideas come from experience. In this book he seeks to give an account of how even ideas like God, infinity, and space could have been acquired through our perceptual access to the world and our mental operations. Book III is something of a digression as Locke turns his attention to language and the role it plays in our theorizing. Locke’s main goal here is cautionary, he thinks language is often an obstacle to understanding and he offers some recommendations to avoid confusion. Finally, Book IV discusses knowledge, belief, and opinion. Locke argues that knowledge consists of special kinds of relations between ideas and that we should regulate our beliefs accordingly.

a. Ideas

The first chapter of the Essay contains an apology for the frequent use of the word “idea” in the book. According to Locke, ideas are the fundamental units of mental content and so play an integral role in his explanation of the human mind and his account of our knowledge. Locke was not the first philosopher to give ideas a central role; Descartes, for example, had relied heavily on them in explaining the human mind. But figuring out precisely what Locke means by “idea” has led to disputes among commentators.

One place to begin is with Locke’s own definition. He claims that by “idea” he means “whatsoever is the Object of the Understanding when a Man thinks…whatever is meant by Phantasm, Notion, Species, or whatever it is, which the Mind can be employ’d about in thinking.” (1.1.8, 47). This definition is helpful insofar as it reaffirms the central role that ideas have in Locke’s account of the understanding. Ideas are the sole entities upon which our minds work. Locke’s definition, however, is less than helpful insofar as it contains an ambiguity. On one reading, ideas are mental objects. The thought is that when an agent perceives an external world object like an apple there is some thing in her mind which represents that apple. So when an agent considers an apple what she is really doing is thinking about the idea of that apple. On a different reading, ideas are mental actions. The thought here is that when an agent perceives an apple she is really perceiving the apple in a direct, unmediated way. The idea is the mental act of making perceptual contact with the external world object. In recent years, most commentators have adopted the first of these two readings. But this debate will be important in the discussion of knowledge below.

b. The Critique of Nativism

The first of the Essay’s four books is devoted to a critique of nativism, the doctrine that some ideas are innate in the human mind, rather than received in experience. It is unclear precisely who Locke’s targets in this book are, though Locke does cite Herbert of Cherbury and other likely candidates include René Descartes, the Cambridge Platonists, and a number of lesser known Anglican theologians. Finding specific targets, however, might not be that important given that much of what Locke seeks to do in Book I is motivate and make plausible the alternative account of idea acquisition that he offers in Book II.

The nativist view which Locke attacks in Book I holds that human beings have mental content which is innate in the mind. This means that there are certain ideas (units of mental content) which were neither acquired via experience nor constructed by the mind out of ideas received in experience. The most popular version of this position holds that there are certain ideas which God planted in all minds at the moment of their creation.

Locke attacks both the view that we have any innate principles (for example, the whole is greater than the part, do unto others as you would have done unto you, etc.) as well as the view that there are any innate singular ideas (for example, God, identity, substance,  and so forth). The main thrust of Locke’s argument lies in pointing out that none of the mental content alleged to be innate is universally shared by all humans. He notes that children and the mentally disabled, for example, do not have in their minds an allegedly innate complex thought like “equals taken from equals leave equals”. He also uses evidence from travel literature to point out that many non-Europeans deny what were taken to be innate moral maxims and that some groups even lack the idea of a God. Locke takes the fact that not all humans have these ideas as evidence that they were not implanted by God in humans minds, and that they are therefore acquired rather than innate.

There is one misunderstanding which it is important to avoid when considering Locke’s anti-nativism. The misunderstanding is, in part, suggested by Locke’s claim that the mind is like a tabula rasa (a blank slate) prior to sense experience. This makes it sound as though the mind is nothing prior to the advent of ideas. In fact, Locke’s position is much more nuanced. He makes it clear that the mind has any number of inherent capacities, predispositions, and inclinations prior to receiving any ideas from sensation. His anti-nativist point is just that none of these is triggered or exercised until the mind receives ideas from sensation. 

c. Idea Acquisition

In Book II Locke offers his alternative theory of how the human mind comes to be furnished with the ideas it has. Every day we think of complex things like orange juice, castles, justice, numbers, and motion. Locke’s claim is that the ultimate origin of all of these ideas lies in experience: “Experience: In that, all our Knowledge is founded; and from that it ultimately derives itself. Our Observation employ’d either about external, sensible Objects; or about the internal Operations of our Minds, perceived and reflected on by ourselves, is that, which supplies our Understandings with all the material of thinking. These two are the Fountains of Knowledge, from whence all the Ideas we have, or can naturally have, do spring.” (2.1.2, 104).

In the above passage Locke allows for two distinct types of experience. Outer experience, or sensation, provides us with ideas from the traditional five senses. Sight gives us ideas of colors, hearing gives us ideas of sounds, and so on. Thus, my idea of a particular shade of green is a product of seeing a fern. And my idea of a particular tone is the product of my being in the vicinity of a piano while it was being played. Inner experience, or reflection, is slightly more complicated. Locke thinks that the human mind is incredibly active; it is constantly performing what he calls operations. For example, I often remember past birthday parties, imagine that I was on vacation, desire a slice of pizza, or doubt that England will win the World Cup. Locke believes that we are able to notice or experience our mind performing these actions and when we do we receive ideas of reflection. These are ideas such as memory, imagination, desire, doubt, judgment, and choice.

Locke’s view is that experience (sensation and reflection) issues us with simple ideas. These are the minimal units of mental content; each simple idea is “in itself uncompounded, [and] contains in it nothing but one uniform Appearance, or Conception in the mind, and is not distinguishable into different Ideas.” (2.2.1, 119). But many of my ideas are not simple ideas. My idea of a glass of orange juice or my idea of the New York subway system, for example, could not be classed a simple ideas. Locke calls ideas like these complex ideas. His view is that complex ideas are the product of combining our simple ideas together in various ways. For example, my complex idea of a glass of orange juice consists of various simple ideas (the color orange, the feeling of coolness, a certain sweet taste, a certain acidic taste, and so forth) combined together into one object. Thus, Locke believes our ideas are compositional. Simple ideas combine to form complex ideas. And these complex ideas can be combined to form even more complex ideas.

We are now in a position to understand the character of Locke’s empiricism. He is committed to the view that all of our ideas, everything we can possibly think of, can be broken down into simple ideas received in experience. The bulk of Book II is devoted to making this empiricism plausible. Locke does this both by undertaking an examination of the various abilities that the human mind has (memory, abstraction, volition, and so forth) and by offering an account of how even abstruse ideas like space, infinity, God, and causation could be constructed using only the simple ideas received in experience.

Our complex ideas are classified into three different groups: substances, modes, and relations. Ideas of substances are ideas of things which are thought to exist independently. Ordinary objects like desks, sheep, and mountains fall into this group. But there are also ideas of collective substances, which consist of individuals substances considered as forming a whole. A group of individual buildings might be considered a town. And a group of individual men and women might be considered together as an army. In addition to describing the way we think about individual substances, Locke also has an interesting discussion of substance-in-general. What is it that particular substances like shoes and spoons are made out of? We could suggest that they are made out of leather and metal. But the question could be repeated, what are leather and metal made of? We might respond that they are made of matter. But even here, Locke thinks we can ask what matter is made of. What gives rise to the properties of matter? Locke claims that we don’t have a very clear idea here. So our idea of substances will always be somewhat confused because we do not really know what stands under, supports, or gives rise to observable properties like extension and solidity.

Ideas of modes are ideas of things which are dependent on substances in some way. In general, this taxonomic category can be somewhat tricky. It does not seem to have a clear parallel in contemporary metaphysics, and it is sometimes thought to be a mere catch-all category for things which are neither substances nor relations. But it is helpful to think of modes as being like features of substances; modes are “such complex Ideas, which however compounded, contain not in them the supposition of subsisting by themselves, but are considered as Dependences on, or Affections of Substances.” (2.12.4, 165). Modes come in two types: simple and mixed. Simple modes are constructed by combining a large number of a single type of simple ideas together. For example, Locke believes there is a simple idea of unity. Our complex idea of the number seven, for example, is a simple mode and is constructed by concatenating seven simple ideas of unity together. Locke uses this category to explain how we think about a number of topics relating to number, space, time, pleasure and pain, and cognition. Mixed modes, on the other hand, involve combining together simple ideas of more than one kind. A great many ideas fall into this category. But the most important ones are moral ideas. Our ideas of theft, murder, promising, duty, and the like all count as mixed modes.

Ideas of relations are ideas that involve more than one substance. My idea of a husband, for example, is more than the idea of an individual man. It also must include the idea of another substance, namely the idea of that man’s spouse. Locke is keen to point out that much more of our thought involves relations than we might previously have thought. For example, when I think about Elizabeth II as the Queen of England my thinking actually involves relations, because I cannot truly think of Elizabeth as a queen without conceiving of her as having a certain relationship of sovereignty to some subjects (individual substances like David Beckham and J.K. Rowling). Locke then goes on to explore the role that relations have in our thinking about causation, space, time, morality, and (very famously) identity.

Throughout his discussion of the different kinds of complex ideas Locke is keen to emphasize that all of our ideas can ultimately be broken down into simple ideas received in sensation and reflection. Put differently, Locke is keenly aware that the success of his empiricist theory of mind depends on its ability to account for all the contents of our minds. Whether or not Locke is successful is a matter of dispute. On some occasions the analysis he gives of how a very complex idea could be constructed using only simple ideas is vague and requires the reader to fill in some gaps. And commentators have also suggested that some of the simple ideas Locke invokes, for example the simple ideas of power and unity, do not seem to be obvious components of our phenomenological experience.

Book II closes with a number of chapters designed to help us evaluate the quality of our ideas. Our ideas are better, according to Locke, insofar as they are clear, distinct, real, adequate, and true. Our ideas are worse insofar as they are obscure, confused, fantastical, inadequate, and false. Clarity and obscurity are explained via an analogy to vision. Clear ideas, like clear images, are crisp and fresh, not faded or diminished in the way that obscure ideas (or images) are. Distinction and confusion have to do with the individuation of ideas. Ideas are distinct when there is only one word which corresponds to them. Confused ideas are ones to which more than one word can correctly apply or ones that lack a clear and consistent correlation to one particular word. To use one of Locke’s examples, an idea of a leopard as a beast with spots would be confused. It is not distinct because the word “lynx” could apply to that idea just as easily as the word “leopard.” Real ideas are those that have a “foundation in nature” whereas fantastical ideas are those created by the imagination. For example, our idea of a horse would be a real idea and our idea of a unicorn would be fantastical. Adequacy and inadequacy have to do with how well ideas match the patterns according to which they were made. Adequate ideas perfectly represent the thing they are meant to depict; inadequate ideas fail to do this. Ideas are true when the mind understands them in a way that is correct according to linguistic practices and the way the world is structured. They are false when the mind misunderstands them along these lines.

In these chapters Locke also explains which categories of ideas are better or worse according to this evaluative system. Simple ideas do very well. Because objects directly produce them in the mind they tend to be clear, distinct, and so forth. Ideas of modes and relations also tend to do very well, but for a different reason. Locke thinks that the archetypes of these ideas are in the mind rather than in the world. As such, it is easy for these ideas to be good because the mind has a clear sense of what the ideas should be like as it constructs them. By contrast, ideas of substances tend to fare very poorly. The archetypes for these ideas are external world objects. Because our perceptual access to these objects is limited in a number of ways and because these objects are so intricate, ideas of substances tend to be confused, inadequate, false, and so forth.

d. Language

Book III of the Essay is concerned with language. Locke admits that this topic is something of a digression. He did not originally plan for language to take up an entire book of the Essay. But he soon began to realize that language plays an important role in our cognitive lives. Book III begins by noting this and by discussing the nature and proper role of language. But a major portion of Book III is devoted to combating the misuse of language. Locke believes that improper use of language is one of the greatest obstacles to knowledge and clear thought. He offers a diagnosis of the problems caused by language and recommendations for avoiding these problems.

Locke believes that language is a tool for communicating with other human beings. Specifically, Locke thinks that we want to communicate about our ideas, the contents of our minds. From here it is a short step to the view that: “Words in their primary or immediate Signification, stand for nothing, but the Ideas in the Mind of him that uses them.” (3.2.2, 405). When an agent utters the word “gold” she is referring to her idea of a shiny, yellowish, malleable substance of great value. When she utters the word “carrot” she is referring to her idea of a long, skinny, orange vegetable which grows underground. Locke is, of course, aware that the names we choose for these ideas are arbitrary and merely a matter of social convention.

Although the primary use of words is to refer to ideas in the mind of the speaker, Locke also allows that words make what he calls “secret reference” to two other things. First, humans also want their words to refer to the corresponding ideas in the minds of other humans. When Smith says “carrot” within earshot of Jones her hope is that Jones also has an idea of the long, skinny vegetable and that saying “carrot” will bring that idea into Jones’ mind. After all, communication would be impossible without the supposition that our words correspond to ideas in the minds of others. Second, humans suppose that their words stand for objects in the world. When Smith says “carrot” she wants to refer to more than just her idea, she also wants to refer to the long skinny objects themselves. But Locke is suspicious of these two other ways of understanding signification. He thinks the latter one, in particular, is illegitimate.

After discussing these basic features of language and reference Locke goes on to discuss specific cases of the relationship between ideas and words: words used for simple ideas, words used for modes, words used for substances, the way in which a single word can refer to a multiplicity of ideas, and so forth. There is also an interesting chapter on “particles.” These are words which do not refer to an idea but instead refer to a certain connection which holds between ideas. For example, if I say “Secretariat is brown” the word “Secretariat” refers to my idea of a certain racehorse, and “brown” refers to my idea of a certain color, but the word “is” does something different. That word is a particle and indicates that I am expressing something about the relationship between my ideas of Secretariat and brown and suggesting that they are connected in a certain way. Other particles includes words like “and”, “but”, “hence”, and so forth.

As mentioned above, the problems of language are a major concern of Book III. Locke thinks that language can lead to confusion and misunderstanding for a number of reasons. The signification of words is arbitrary, rather than natural, and this means it can be difficult to understand which words refer to which ideas. Many of our words stand for ideas which are complex, hard to acquire, or both. So many people will struggle to use those words appropriately. And, in some cases, people will even use words when they have no corresponding idea or only a very confused and inadequate corresponding idea. Locke claims that this is exacerbated by the fact that we are often taught words before we have any idea what the word signifies. A child, for example, might be taught the word “government” at a young age, but it will take her years to form a clear idea of what governments are and how they operate. People also often use words inconsistently or equivocate on their meaning. Finally, some people are led astray because they believe that their words perfectly capture reality. Recall from above that people secretly and incorrectly use their words to refer to objects in the external world. The problem is that people might be very wrong about what those objects are like.

Locke thinks that a result of all this is that people are seriously misusing language and that many debates and discussions in important fields like science, politics, and philosophy are confused or consist of merely verbal disputes. Locke provides a number of examples of language causing problems: Cartesians using “body” and “extension” interchangeably, even though the two ideas are distinct; physiologists who agree on all the facts yet have a long dispute because they have different understandings of the word “liquor”; Scholastic philosophers using the term “prime matter” when they are unable to actually frame an idea of such a thing, and so forth.

The remedies that Locke recommends for fixing these problems created by language are somewhat predictable. But Locke is quick to point out that while they sound like easy fixes they are actually quite difficult to implement. The first and most important step is to only use words when we have clear ideas attached to them. (Again, this sounds easy, but many of us might actually struggle to come up with a clear idea corresponding to even everyday terms like “glory” or “fascist”.) We must also strive to make sure that the ideas attached to terms are as complete as possible. We must strive to ensure that we use words consistently and do not equivocate; every time we utter a word we should use it to signify one and the same idea. Finally, we should communicate our definitions of words to others.

e. The Account of Knowledge

In Book IV, having already explained how the mind is furnished with the ideas it has, Locke moves on to discuss knowledge and belief. A good place to start is with a quote from the beginning of Book IV: “Knowledge then seems to me to be nothing but the perception of the connexion and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy of any of our Ideas. Where this Perception is, there is Knowledge, and where it is not, there, though we may fancy, guess, or believe, yet we always come short of Knowledge.” (4.2.2, 525). Locke spends the first part of Book IV clarifying and exploring this conception of knowledge. The second part focuses on how we should apportion belief in cases where we lack knowledge.

What does Locke mean by the “connection and agreement” and the “disagreement and repugnancy” of our ideas? Some examples might help. Bring to mind your idea of white and your idea of black. Locke thinks that upon doing this you will immediately perceive that they are different, they “disagree”. It is when you perceive this disagreement that you know the fact that white is not black. Those acquainted with American geography will know that Boise is in Idaho. On Locke’s account of knowledge, this means that they are able to perceive a certain connection that obtains between their idea of Idaho and their idea of Boise. Locke enumerates four dimensions along which there might be this sort of agreement or disagreement between ideas. First, we can perceive when two ideas are identical or non-identical. For example, knowing that sweetness is not bitterness consists in perceiving that the idea of sweetness is not identical to the idea of bitterness. Second, we can perceive relations that obtain between ideas. For example, knowing that 7 is greater than 3 consists in perceiving that there is a size relation of bigger and smaller between the two ideas. Third, we can perceive when our idea of a certain feature accompanies our idea of a certain thing. If I know that ice is cold this is because I perceive that my idea of cold always accompanies my idea of ice. Fourthly, we can perceive when existence agrees with any idea. I can have knowledge of this fourth kind when, for example, I perform the cogito and recognize the special relation between my idea of myself and my idea of existence. Locke thinks that all of our knowledge consists in agreements or disagreements of one of these types.

After detailing the types of relations between ideas which constitute knowledge Locke continues on to discuss three “degrees” of knowledge in 4.2. These degrees seem to consist in different ways of knowing something. The first degree Locke calls intuitive knowledge. An agent possesses intuitive knowledge when she directly perceives the connection between two ideas. This is the best kind of knowledge, as Locke says “Such kind of Truths, the Mind perceives at the first sight of the Ideas together, by bare Intuition, without the intervention of any other Idea; and this kind of knowledge is the clearest, and most certain, that humane Frailty is capable of.” (4.2.1, 531). The second degree of knowledge is called demonstrative. Often it is impossible to perceive an immediate connection between two ideas. For example, most of us are unable to tell that the three interior angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles simply by looking at them. But most of us, with the assistance of a mathematics teacher, can be made to see that they are equal by means of a geometric proof or demonstration. This is the model for demonstrative knowledge. Even if one is unable to directly perceive a relation between idea-X and idea-Y one might perceive a relation indirectly by means of idea-A and idea-B. This will be possible if the agent has intuitive knowledge of a connection between X and A, between A and B, and then between B and Y. Demonstrative knowledge consists, therefore, in a string of relations each of which is known intuitively.

The third degree of knowledge is called sensitive knowledge and has been the source of considerable debate and confusion among Locke commentators. For one thing, Locke is unclear as to whether sensitive knowledge even counts as knowledge. He writes that intuitive and demonstrative knowledge are, properly speaking, the only forms of knowledge, but that “There is, indeed, another Perception of the Mind…which going beyond bare probability, and yet not reaching perfectly to either of the foregoing degrees of certainty, passes under the name of Knowledge.” (4.2.14, 537). Sensitive knowledge has to do with the relationship between our ideas and the objects in the external world that produce them. Locke claims that we can be certain that when we perceive something, an orange, for example, there is an object in the external world which is responsible for these sensations. Part of Locke’s claim is that there is a serious qualitative difference between biting into an orange and remembering biting into an orange. There is something in the phenomenological experience of the former which assures us of a corresponding object in the external world.

Locke spends a fair amount of time in Book IV responding to worries that he is a skeptic or that his account of knowledge, with its emphasis on ideas, fails to be responsive to the external world. The general worry for Locke is fairly simple. By claiming that ideas are the only things humans have epistemic access to, and by claiming that knowledge relates only to our ideas, Locke seems to rule out the claim that we can ever know about the external world. Lockean agents are trapped behind a “veil of ideas.” Thus we cannot have any assurance that our ideas provide us with reliable information about the external world. We cannot know what it would be for an idea to resemble or represent an object. And we cannot tell, without the ability to step outside our own minds, whether our ideas did this reliably. This criticism has historically been thought to endanger Locke’s entire project. Gilbert Ryle’s memorable assessment is that “nearly every youthful student of philosophy both can and does in his second essay refute Locke’s entire Theory of Knowledge.” Recent scholarship has been much more charitable to Locke. But the central problem is still a pressing one.

Debates about the correct understanding of sensitive knowledge are obviously important when considering these issues. At first blush, the relation involved in sensitive knowledge seems to be a relation between an idea and a physical object in the world. But, if this reading is correct, then it becomes difficult to understand the many passages in which Locke insists that knowledge is a relation that holds only between ideas. Also relevant are debates about how to correctly understand Lockean ideas. Recall from above that although many understand ideas as mental objects, some understand them as mental acts. While most of the text seems to favor the first interpretation, it seems that the second interpretation has a significant advantage when responding to these skeptical worries. The reason is that the connection between ideas and external world objects is built right into the definition of an idea. An idea just is a perception of an external world object.

However the debates discussed in the previous paragraph are resolved, there is a consensus among commentators that Locke believes the scope of human understanding is very narrow. Humans are not capable of very much knowledge. Locke discusses this is 4.3, a chapter entitled “Extent of Humane Knowledge.” The fact that our knowledge is so limited should come as no surprise. We have already discussed the ways in which our ideas of substances are problematic. And we have just seen that we have no real understanding of the connection between our ideas and the objects that produce them.

The good news, however, is that while our knowledge might not be very extensive, it is sufficient for our needs. Locke’s memorable nautical metaphor holds that: “’Tis of great use to the Sailor to know the length of his Line, though he cannot with it fathom all the depths of the Ocean. ‘Tis well he knows, that it is long enough to reach the bottom, at such Places, as are necessary to direct his Voyage, and caution him against running upon Shoales, that may ruin him. Our Business here is not to know all things, but those which concern our Conduct.” (1.1.6, 46). Locke thinks we have enough knowledge to live comfortable lives on Earth, to realize that there is a God, to understand morality and behave appropriately, and to gain salvation. Our knowledge of morality, in particular, is very good. Locke even suggests that we might develop a demonstrable system of morality similar to Euclid’s demonstrable system of geometry. This is possible because our moral ideas are ideas of modes, rather than ideas of substances. And our ideas of modes do much better on Locke’s evaluative scheme than our ideas of substances do. Finally, while the limits to our knowledge might be disappointing, Locke notes that recognizing these limits is important and useful insofar as it will help us to better organize our intellectual inquiry. We will be saved from investigating questions which we could never know the answers to and can focus our efforts on areas where progress is possible.

One benefit of Locke’s somewhat bleak assessment of the scope of our knowledge was that it caused him to focus on an area which was underappreciated by many of his contemporaries. This was the arena of judgment or opinion, belief states which fall short of knowledge. Given that we have so little knowledge (that we can be certain of so little) the realm of probability becomes very important. Recall that knowledge consists in a perceived agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Belief that falls short of knowledge (judgment or opinion) consists in a presumed agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Consider an example: I am not entirely sure who the Prime Minister of Canada is, but I am somewhat confident it is Stephen Harper. Locke’s claim is that in judging that the Canadian PM is Stephen Harper I am acting as though a relation holds between the two ideas. I do not directly perceive a connection between my idea of Stephen Harper and my idea of the Canadian PM, but I presume that one exists.

After offering this account of what judgment is, Locke offers an analysis of how and why we form the opinions we do and offers some recommendations for forming our opinions responsibly. This includes a diagnosis of the errors people make in judging, a discussion of the different degrees of assent, and an interesting discussion of the epistemic value of testimony.

3. Special Topics in the Essay

As discussed above, the main project of the Essay is an examination of the human understanding and an analysis of knowledge. But the Essay is a rather expansive work and contains discussion of many other topics of philosophical interest. Some of these will be discussed below. A word of warning, however, is required before proceeding. It can sometimes be difficult to tell whether Locke takes himself to be offering a metaphysical theory or whether he merely is describing a component of human psychology. For example, we might question whether his account of personal identity is meant to give necessary and sufficient conditions for a metaphysical account of personhood or whether it is merely designed to tell us what sorts of identity attributions we do and should make and why. We may further question whether, when discussing primary and secondary qualities, Locke is offering a theory about how perception really works or whether this discussion is a mere digression used to illustrate a point about the nature of our ideas. So while many of these topics have received a great deal of attention, their precise relationship to the main project of the Essay can be difficult to locate.

a. Primary and Secondary Qualities

Book 2, Chapter 8 of the Essay contains an extended discussion of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Locke was hardly original in making this distinction. By the time the Essay was published, it had been made by many others and was even somewhat commonplace. That said, Locke’s formulation of the distinction and his analysis of the related issues has been tremendously influential and has provided the framework for much of the subsequent discussion on the topic.

Locke defines a quality as a power that a body has to produce ideas in us. So a simple object like a baked potato which can produce ideas of brownness, heat, ovular shape, solidity, and determinate size must have a series of corresponding qualities. There must be something in the potato which gives us the idea of brown, something in the potato which gives us the idea of ovular shape, and so on. The primary/secondary quality distinction claims that some of these qualities are very different from others.

Locke motivates the distinction between two types of qualities by discussing how a body could produce an idea in us. The theory of perception endorsed by Locke is highly mechanical. All perception occurs as a result of motion and collision. If I smell the baked potato, there must be small material particles which are flying off of the potato and bumping into nerves in my nose, the motion in the nose-nerves causes a chain reaction along my nervous system until eventually there is some motion in my brain and I experience the idea of a certain smell. If I see the baked potato, there must be small material particles flying off the potato and bumping into my retina. That bumping causes a similar chain reaction which ends in my experience of a certain roundish shape.

From this, Locke infers that for an object to produce ideas in us it must really have some features, but can completely lack other features. This mechanical theory of perception requires that objects producing ideas in us have shape, extension, mobility, and solidity. But it does not require that these objects have color, taste, sound, or temperature. So the primary qualities are qualities actually possessed by bodies. These are features that a body cannot be without. The secondary qualities, by contrast, are not really had by bodies. They are just ways of talking about the ideas that can be produced in us by bodies in virtue of their primary qualities. So when we claim that the baked potato is solid, this means that solidity is one of its fundamental features. But when I claim that it smells a certain earthy kind of way, this just means that its fundamental features are capable of producing the idea of the earthy smell in my mind.

These claims lead to Locke’s claims about resemblance: “From whence I think it is easie to draw this Observation, That the Ideas of primary Qualities of Bodies, are Resemblances of them, and their Patterns do really exist in the Bodies themselves; but the Ideas, produced in us by these Secondary Qualities, have no resemblance of them at all.” (2.8.14, 137). Insofar as my idea of the potato is of something solid, extended, mobile, and possessing a certain shape my idea accurately captures something about the real nature of the potato. But insofar as my idea of the potato is of something with a particular smell, temperature, and taste my ideas do not accurately capture mind-independent facts about the potato.

b. Mechanism

Around the time of the Essay the mechanical philosophy was emerging as the predominant theory about the physical world. The mechanical philosophy held that the fundamental entities in the physical world were small individual bodies called corpuscles. Each corpuscle was solid, extended, and had a certain shape. These corpuscles could combine together to form ordinary objects like rocks, tables, and plants. The mechanical philosophy argued that all features of bodies and all natural phenomena could be explained by appeal to these corpuscles and their basic properties (in particular, size, shape, and motion).

Locke was exposed to the mechanical philosophy while at Oxford and became acquainted with the writings of its most prominent advocates. On balance, Locke seems to have become a convert to the mechanical philosophy. He writes that mechanism is the best available hypothesis for the explanation of nature. We have already seen some of the explanatory work done by mechanism in the Essay. The distinction between primary and secondary qualities was a hallmark of the mechanical philosophy and neatly dovetailed with mechanist accounts of perception. Locke reaffirms his commitment to this account of perception at a number of other points in the Essay. And when discussing material objects Locke is very often happy to allow that they are composed of material corpuscles. What is peculiar, however, is that while the Essay does seem to have a number of passages in which Locke supports mechanical explanations and speaks highly of mechanism, it also contains some highly critical remarks about mechanism and discussions of the limits of the mechanical philosophy.

Locke’s critiques of mechanism can be divided into two strands. First, he recognized that there were a number of observed phenomena which mechanism struggled to explain. Mechanism did offer neat explanations of some observed phenomena. For example, the fact that objects could be seen but not smelled through glass could be explained by positing that the corpuscles which interacted with our retinas were smaller than the ones which interacted with our nostrils. So the sight corpuscles could pass through the spaces between the glass corpuscles, but the smell corpuscles would be turned away. But other phenomena were harder to explain. Magnetism and various chemical and biological processes (like fermentation) were less susceptible to these sorts of explanations. And universal gravitation, which Locke took Newton to have proved the existence of in the Principia, was particularly hard to explain. Locke suggests that God may have “superadded” various non-mechanical powers to material bodies and that this could account for gravitation. (Indeed, at several points he even suggests that God may have superadded the power of thought to matter and that humans might be purely material beings.)

Locke’s second set of critiques pertain to theoretical problems in the mechanical philosophy. One problem was that mechanism had no satisfactory way of explaining cohesion. Why do corpuscles sometimes stick together? If things like tables and chairs are just collections of small corpuscles then they should be very easy to break apart, the same way I can easily separate one group of marbles from another. Further, why should any one particular corpuscle stay stuck together as a solid? What accounts for its cohesion? Again, mechanism seems hard-pressed to offer an answer. Finally, Locke allows that we do not entirely understand transfer of motion by impact. When one corpuscle collides with another we actually do not have a very satisfying explanation for why the second moves away under the force of the impact.

Locke presses these critiques with some skill and in a serious manner. Still, ultimately he is guardedly optimistic about mechanism. This somewhat mixed attitude on Locke’s part has led commentators to debate questions about his exact attitude toward the mechanical philosophy and his motivations for discussing it.

c. Volition and Agency

In Book 2, Chapter 21 of the Essay Locke explores the topic of the will. One of the things which separates people from rocks and billiard balls is our ability to make decisions and control our actions. We feel that we are free in certain respects and that we have the power to choose certain thoughts and actions. Locke calls this power the will. But there are tricky questions about what this power consists in and about what it takes to freely (or voluntarily) choose something. 2.21 contains a delicate and sustained discussion of these tricky questions.

Locke first begins with questions of freedom and then proceeds to a discussion of the will. On Locke’s analysis, we are free to do those things which we both will to do and are physically capable of doing. For example, if I wish to jump into a lake and have no physical maladies which prevent it, then I am free to jump into the lake. By contrast, if I do not wish to jump into the lake, but a friend pushes me in, I did not act freely when I entered the water. Or, if I wish to jump into the lake, but have a spinal injury and cannot move my body, then I do not act freely when I stay on the shore. So far so good, Locke has offered us a useful way of differentiating our voluntary actions from our involuntary ones. But there is still a pressing question about freedom and the will: that of whether the will is itself free. When I am deciding whether or not to jump into the water, is the will determined by outside factors to choose one or the other? Or can it, so to speak, make up its own mind and choose either option?

Locke’s initial position in the chapter is that the will is determined. But in later sections he offers a qualification of sorts. In normal circumstances, the will is determined by what Locke calls uneasiness: “What is it that determines the Will in regard to our Actions? … some (and for the most part the most pressing) uneasiness a Man is at present under. That is that which successively determines the Will, and sets us upon those Actions, we perform.” (2.21.31, 250-1). The uneasiness is caused by the absence of something that is perceived as good. The perception of the thing as good gives rise to a desire for that thing. Suppose I choose to eat a slice of pizza. Locke would say I must have made this choice because the absence of the pizza was troubling me somehow (I was feeling hunger pains, or longing for something savory) and this discomfort gave rise to a desire for food. That desire in turn determined my will to choose to eat pizza.

Locke’s qualification to this account of the will being determined by uneasiness has to do with what he calls suspension. Beginning with the second edition of the Essay, Locke began to argue that the most pressing desire for the most part determines the will, but not always: “For the mind having in most cases, as is evident in Experience, a power to suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires, and so all, one after another, is at liberty to consider the objects of them; examine them on all sides, and weigh them with others.” (2.21.47, 263). So even if, at this moment, my desire for pizza is the strongest desire, Locke thinks I can pause before I decide to eat the pizza and consider the decision. I can consider other items in my desire set: my desire to lose weight, or to leave the pizza for my friend, or to keep a vegan diet. Careful consideration of these other possibilities might have the effect of changing my desire set. If I really focus on how important it is to stay fit and healthy by eating nutritious foods then my desire to leave the pizza might become stronger than my desire to eat it and my will may be determined to choose to not eat the pizza. But of course we can always ask whether a person has a choice whether or not to suspend judgment or whether the suspension of judgment is itself determined by the mind’s strongest desire. On this point Locke is somewhat vague. While most interpreters think our desires determine when judgment is suspended, some others disagree and argue that suspension of judgment offers Lockean agents a robust form of free will.

d. Personhood and Personal Identity

Locke was one of the first philosophers to give serious attention to the question of personal identity. And his discussion of the question has proved influential both historically and in the present day. The discussion occurs in the midst of Locke’ larger discussion of the identity conditions for various entities in Book II, Chapter 27. At heart, the question is simple, what makes me the same person as the person who did certain things in the past and that will do certain things in the future? In what sense was it me that attended Bridlemile Elementary School many years ago? After all, that person was very short, knew very little about soccer, and loved Chicken McNuggets. I, on the other hand, am average height, know tons of soccer trivia, and get rather queasy at the thought of eating chicken, especially in nugget form. Nevertheless, it is true that I am identical to the boy who attended Bridlemile.

In Locke’s time, the topic of personal identity was important for religious reasons. Christian doctrine held that there was an afterlife in which virtuous people would be rewarded in heaven and sinful people would be punished in hell. This scheme provided motivation for individuals to behave morally. But, for this to work, it was important that the person who is rewarded or punished is the same person as the one who lived virtuously or lived sinfully. And this had to be true even though the person being rewarded or punished had died, had somehow continued to exist in an afterlife, and had somehow managed to be reunited with a body. So it was important to get the issue of personal identity right.

Locke’s views on personal identity involve a negative project and a positive project. The negative project involves arguing against the view that personal identity consists in or requires the continued existence of a particular substance. And the positive project involves defending the view that personal identity consists in continuity of consciousness. We can begin with this positive view. Locke defines a person as “a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places; which it does only by that consciousness, which is inseparable from thinking, and as it seems to me essential to it.” (2.27.9, 335).  Locke suggests here that part of what makes a person the same through time is their ability to recognize past experiences as belonging to them. For me, part of what differentiates one little boy who attended Bridlemile Elementary from all the other children who went there is my realization that I share in his consciousness. Put differently, my access to his lived experience at Bridlemile is very different from my access to the lived experiences of others there: it is first-personal and immediate. I recognize his experiences there as part of a string of experiences that make up my life and join up to my current self and current experiences in a unified way. That is what makes him the same person as me.

Locke believes that this account of personal identity as continuity of consciousness obviates the need for an account of personal identity given in terms of substances. A traditional view held that there was a metaphysical entity, the soul, which guaranteed personal identity through time; wherever there was the same soul, the same person would be there as well. Locke offers a number of thought experiments to cast doubt on this belief and show that his account is superior. For example, if a soul was wiped clean of all its previous experiences and given new ones (as might be the case if reincarnation were true), the same soul would not justify the claim that all of those who had had it were the same person. Or, we could imagine two souls who had their conscious experiences completely swapped. In this case, we would want to say that the person went with the conscious experiences and did not remain with the soul.

Locke’s account of personal identity seems to be a deliberate attempt to move away from some of the metaphysical alternatives and to offer an account which would be acceptable to individuals from a number of different theological backgrounds. Of course, a number of serious challenges have been raised for Locke’s account.. Most of these focus on the crucial role seemingly played by memory. And the precise details of Locke’s positive proposal in 2.27 have been hard to pin down. Nevertheless, many contemporary philosophers believe that there is an important kernel of truth in Locke’s analysis.

e. Real and Nominal Essences

Locke’s distinction between the real essence of a substance and the nominal essence of a substance is one of the most fascinating components of the Essay. Scholastic philosophers had held that the main goal of metaphysics and science was to learn about the essences of things: the key metaphysical components of things which explained all of their interesting features. Locke thought this project was misguided. That sort of knowledge, knowledge of the real essences of beings, was unavailable to human beings. This led Locke to suggest an alternative way to understand and investigate nature; he recommends focusing on the nominal essences of things.

When Locke introduces the term real essence he uses it to refer to the “real constitution of any Thing, which is the foundation of all those Properties, that are combined in, and are constantly found to co-exist with [an object]” (3.6.6, 442). For the Scholastics this real essence would be an object’s substantial form. For proponents of the mechanical philosophy it would be the number and arrangement of the material corpuscles which composed the body. Locke sometimes endorses this latter understanding of real essence. But he insists that these real essences are entirely unknown and undiscoverable by us. The nominal essences, by contrast, are known and are the best way we have to understand individual substances. Nominal essences are just collections of all the observed features an individual thing has. So the nominal essence of a piece of gold would include the ideas of yellowness, a certain weight, malleability, dissolvability in certain chemicals, and so on.

Locke offers us a helpful analogy to illustrate the difference between real and nominal essences. He suggests that our position with respect to ordinary objects is like the position of someone looking at a very complicated clock. The gears, wheels, weights, and pendulum that produce the motions of the hands on the clock face (the clock’s real essence) are unknown to the person. They are hidden behind the casing. He or she can only know about the observable features like the clock’s shape, the movement of the hands, and the chiming of the hours (the clock’s nominal essence). Similarly, when I look at an object like a dandelion, I am only able to observe its nominal essence (the yellow color, the bitter smell, and so forth). I have no clear idea what produces these features of the dandelion or how they are produced.

Locke’s views on real and nominal essences have important consequences for his views about the division of objects into groups and sorts. Why do we consider some things to be zebras and other things to be rabbits? Locke’s view is that we group according to nominal essence, not according to (unknown) real essence. But this has the consequence that our groupings might fail to adequately reflect whatever real distinctions there might be in nature. So Locke is not a realist about species or types. Instead, he is a conventionalist. We project these divisions on the world when we choose to classify objects as falling under the various nominal essences we’ve created.

f. Religious Epistemology

The epistemology of religion (claims about our understanding of God and our duties with respect to him) were tremendously contentious during Locke’s lifetime. The English Civil War, fought during Locke’s youth, was in large part a disagreement over the right way to understand the Christian religion and the requirements of religious faith. Throughout the seventeenth century, a number of fundamentalist Christian sects continually threatened the stability of English political life. And the status of Catholic and Jewish people in England was a vexed one.

So the stakes were very high when, in 4.18, Locke discussed the nature of faith and reason and their respective domains. He defines reason as an attempt to discover certainty or probability through the use of our natural faculties in the investigation of the world. Faith, by contrast, is certainty or probability attained through a communication believed to have come, originally, from God. So when Smith eats a potato chip and comes to believe it is salty, she believes this according to reason. But when Smith believes that Joshua made the sun stand still in the sky because she read it in the Bible (which she takes to be divine revelation), she believes according to faith.

Although it initially sounds as though Locke has carved out quite separate roles for faith and reason, it must be noted that these definitions make faith subordinate to reason in a subtle way. For, as Locke explains: “Whatever GOD hath revealed, is certainly true; no Doubt can be made of it. This is the proper Object of Faith: But whether it be a divine Revelation, or no, Reason must judge; which can never permit the Mind to reject a greater Evidence to embrace what is less evident, nor allow it to entertain Probability in opposition to Knowledge and Certainty.” (4.18.10, 695). First, Locke thinks that if any proposition, even one which purports to be divinely revealed, clashes with the clear evidence of reason then it should not be believed. So, even if it seems like God is telling us that 1+1=3, Locke claims we should go on believing that 1+1=2 and we should deny that the 1+1=3 revelation was genuine. Second, Locke thinks that to determine whether or not something is divinely revealed we have to exercise our reason. How can we tell whether the Bible contains God’s direct revelation conveyed through the inspired Biblical authors or whether it is instead the work of mere humans? Only reason can help us settle that question. Locke thinks that those who ignore the importance of reason in determining what is and is not a matter of faith are guilty of “enthusiasm.” And in a chapter added to later editions of the Essay Locke sternly warns his readers against the serious dangers posed by this intellectual vice.

In all of this Locke emerges as a strong moderate. He himself was deeply religious and took religious faith to be important. But he also felt that there were serious limits to what could be justified through appeals to faith. The issues discussed in this section will be very important below where Locke’s views on the importance of religious toleration are discussed.

4. Political Philosophy

Locke lived during a very eventful time in English politics. The Civil War, Interregnum, Restoration, Exclusion Crisis, and Glorious Revolution all happened during his lifetime. For much of his life Locke held administrative positions in government and paid very careful attention to contemporary debates in political theory. So it is perhaps unsurprising that he wrote a number of works on political issues. In this field, Locke is best known for his arguments in favor of religious toleration and limited government. Today these ideas are commonplace and widely accepted. But in Locke’s time they were highly innovative, even radical.

a. The Two Treatises

Locke’s Two Treatises of Government were published in 1689. It was originally thought that they were intended to defend the Glorious Revolution and William’s seizure of the throne. We now know, however, that they were in fact composed much earlier. Nonetheless, they do lay out a view of government amenable to many of William’s supporters.

The First Treatise is now of primarily historical interest. It takes the form of a detailed critique of a work called Patriacha by Robert Filmer. Filmer had argued, in a rather unsophisticated way, in favor of divine right monarchy. On his view, the power of kings ultimately originated in the dominion which God gave to Adam and which had passed down in an unbroken chain through the ages. Locke disputes this picture on a number of historical grounds. Perhaps more importantly, Locke also distinguishes between a number of different types of dominion or governing power which Filmer had run together.

After clearing some ground in the First Treatise, Locke offers a positive view of the nature of government in the much better known Second Treatise. Part of Locke’s strategy in this work was to offer a different account of the origins of government. While Filmer had suggested that humans had always been subject to political power, Locke argues for the opposite. According to him, humans were initially in a state of nature. The state of nature was apolitical in the sense that there were no governments and each individual retained all of his or her natural rights. People possessed these natural rights (including the right to attempt to preserve one’s life, to seize unclaimed valuables, and so forth) because they were given by God to all of his people.

The state of nature was inherently unstable. Individuals would be under contrast threat of physical harm. And they would be unable to pursue any goals that required stability and widespread cooperation with other humans. Locke’s claim is that government arose in this context. Individuals, seeing the benefits which could be gained, decided to relinquish some of their rights to a central authority while retaining other rights. This took the form of a contract. In agreement for relinquishing certain rights, individuals would receive protection from physical harm, security for their possessions, and the ability to interact and cooperate with other humans in a stable environment.

So, according to this view, governments were instituted by the citizens of those governments. This has a number of very important consequences. On this view, rulers have an obligation to be responsive to the needs and desires of these citizens. Further, in establishing a government the citizens had relinquished some, but not all of their original rights. So no ruler could claim absolute power over all elements of a citizen’s life. This carved out important room for certain individual rights or liberties. Finally, and perhaps most importantly, a government which failed to adequately protect the rights and interests of its citizens or a government which attempted to overstep its authority would be failing to perform the task for which it was created. As such, the citizens would be entitled to revolt and replace the existing government with one which would suitably carry out the duties of ensuring peace and civil order while respecting individual rights.

So Locke was able to use the account of natural rights and a government created through contract to accomplish a number of important tasks. He could use it to show why individuals retain certain rights even when they are subject to a government. He could use it to show why despotic governments which attempted to unduly infringe on the rights of their citizens were bad. And he could use it to show that citizens had a right to revolt in instances where governments failed in certain ways. These are powerful ideas which remain important even today.

For more. see the article Political Philosophy.

b. Property

Locke’s Second Treatise on government contains an influential account of the nature of private property. According to Locke, God gave humans the world and its contents to have in common. The world was to provide humans with what was necessary for the continuation and enjoyment of life. But Locke also believed it was possible for individuals to appropriate individual parts of the world and justly hold them for their own exclusive use. Put differently, Locke believed that we have a right to acquire private property.

Locke’s claim is that we acquire property by mixing our labor with some natural resource. For example, if I discover some grapes growing on a vine, through my labor in picking and collecting these grapes I acquire an ownership right over them. If I find an empty field and then use my labor to plow the field then plant and raise crops, I will be the proper owner of those crops. If I chop down trees in an unclaimed forest and use the wood to fashion a table, then that table will be mine. Locke places two important limitations on the way in which property can be acquired by mixing one’s labor with natural resources. First, there is what has come to be known as the Waste Proviso. One must not take so much property that some of it goes to waste. I should not appropriate gallons and gallons of grapes if I am only able to eat a few and the rest end up rotting. If the goods of the Earth were given to us by God, it would be inappropriate to allow some of this gift to go to waste. Second, there is the Enough-And-As-Good Proviso. This says that in appropriating resources I am required to leave enough and as good for others to appropriate. If the world was left to us in common by God, it would be wrong of me to appropriate more than my fair share and fail to leave sufficient resources for others.

After currency is introduced and after governments are established the nature of property obviously changes a great deal. Using metal, which can be made into coins and which does not perish the way foodstuffs and other goods do, individuals are able to accumulate much more wealth than would be possible otherwise. So the proviso concerning waste seems to drop away. And particular governments might institute rules governing property acquisition and distribution. Locke was aware of this and devoted a great deal of thought to the nature of property and the proper distribution of property within a commonwealth. His writings on economics, monetary policy, charity, and social welfare systems are evidence of this. But Locke’s views on property inside of a commonwealth have received far less attention than his views on the original acquisition of property in the state of nature.

c. Toleration

Locke had been systematically thinking about issues relating to religious toleration since his early years in London and even though he only published his Epistola de Tolerantia (A Letter Concerning Toleration) in 1689 he had finished writing it several years before. The question of whether or not a state should attempt to prescribe one particular religion within the state, what means states might use to do so, and what the correct attitude should be toward those who resist conversion to the official state religion had been central to European politics ever since the Protestant Reformation. Locke’s time in England, France, and the Netherlands had given him experiences of three very different approaches to these questions. These experiences had convinced him that, for the most part, individuals should be allowed to practice their religion without interference from the state. Indeed, part of the impetus for the publication of Locke’s Letter Concerning Toleration came from Louis XIV’s revocation of the Edict of Nantes, which took away the already limited rights of Protestants in France and exposed them to state persecution.

It is possible to see Locke’s arguments in favor of toleration as relating both to the epistemological views of the Essay and the political views of the Two Treatises. Relating to Locke’s epistemological views, recall from above that Locke thought the scope of human knowledge was extremely restricted. We might not be particularly good at determining what the correct religion is. There is no reason to think that those holding political power will be any better at discovering the true religion than anyone else, so they should not attempt to enforce their views on others. Instead, each individual should be allowed to pursue true beliefs as best as they are able. Little harm results from allowing others to have their own religious beliefs.  Indeed, it might be beneficial to allow a plurality of beliefs because one group might end up with the correct beliefs and win others over to their side.

Relating to Locke’s political views, as expressed in the Two Treatises, Locke endorses toleration on the grounds that the enforcement of religious conformity is outside the proper scope of government. People consent to governments for the purpose of establishing social order and the rule of law. Governments should refrain from enforcing religious conformity because doing so is unnecessary and irrelevant for these ends. Indeed, attempting to enforce conformity may positively harm these ends as it will likely lead to resistance from members of prohibited religions. Locke also suggests that governments should tolerate the religious beliefs of individual citizens because enforcing religious belief is actually impossible. Acceptance of a certain religion is an inward act, a function of one’s beliefs. But governments are designed to control people’s actions. So governments are, in many ways, ill-equipped to enforce the adoption of a particular religion because individual people have an almost perfect control of their own thoughts.

While Locke’s views on toleration were very progressive for the time and while his views do have an affinity with our contemporary consensus on the value of religious toleration it is important to recognize that Locke did place some severe limits on toleration. He did not think that we should tolerate the intolerant, those who would seek to forcibly impose their religious views on others. Similarly, any religious group who posed a threat to political stability or public safety should not be tolerated. Importantly, Locke included Roman Catholics in this group. On his view, Catholics had a fundamental allegiance to the Pope, a foreign prince who did not recognize the sovereignty of English law. This made Catholics a threat to civil government and peace. Finally, Locke also believed that atheists should not be tolerated. Because they did not believe they would be rewarded or punished for their actions in an afterlife, Locke did not think they could be trusted to behave morally or maintain their contractual obligations.

5. Theology

We have already seen that in the Essay Locke developed an account of belief according to faith and belief according to reason. Recall that an agent believes according to reason when she discovers something through the use of her natural faculties and she believes according to faith when she takes something as truth because she understands it to be a message from God. Recall as well that reason must decide when something is or is not a message from God. The goal of Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity is to show that it is reasonable to be a Christian. Locke argues that we do have sufficient reason to think that the central truths of Christianity were communicated to us by God through his messenger, Jesus of Nazareth.

For Locke’s project to succeed he needed to show that Jesus provided his original followers with sufficient evidence that he was a legitimate messenger from God. Given that numerous individuals in history had purported to be the recipients of divine revelation, there must be something special which set Jesus apart. Locke offers two considerations in this regard. The first is that Jesus fulfilled a number of historical predictions concerning the coming of a Messiah. The second is that Jesus performed a number of miracles which attest that he had a special relationship to God. Locke also claims that we have sufficient reason to believe that these miracles actually occurred on the basis of testimony from those who witnessed them first-hand and a reliable chain of reporting from Jesus’ time into our own. This argument leads Locke into a discussion of the types and value of testimony which many philosophers have found to be interesting in its own right.

One striking feature of The Reasonableness of Christianity is the requirement for salvation that Locke endorses. Disputes about which precise beliefs were necessary for salvation and eternal life in Heaven were at the core of much religious disagreement in Locke’s time. Different denominations and sects claimed that they, and often only they, had the correct beliefs. Locke, by contrast, argued that to be a true Christian and worthy of salvation an individual only need to believe one simple truth: that Jesus is the Messiah. Of course, Locke believed there were many other important truths in the Bible. But he thought these other truths, especially those contained in the Epistles rather than the Gospels, could be difficult to interpret and could lead to disputes and disagreement. The core tenet of Christianity, however, that Jesus is the Messiah, was a mandatory belief.

In making the requirements for Christian faith and salvation so minimal Locke was part of a growing faction in the Church of England. These individuals, often known as latitudinarians, were deliberately attempting to construct a more irenic Christianity with the goal of avoiding the conflict and controversy that previous internecine fights had produced. So Locke was hardly alone in attempting to find a set of core Christian commitments which were free of sectarian theological baggage. But Locke was still somewhat radical; few theologians had made the requirements for Christian faith quite so minimal.

6. Education

Locke was regarded by many in his time as an expert on educational matters. He taught many students at Oxford and also served as a private tutor. Locke’s correspondence shows that he was constantly asked to recommend tutors and offer pedagogical advice. Locke’s expertise led to his most important work on the subject: Some Thoughts Concerning Education. The work had its origins in a series of letters Locke wrote to Edward Clarke offering advice on the education of Clarke’s children and was first published in 1693.

Locke’s views on education were, for the time, quite forward-looking. Classical languages, usually learned through tedious exercises involving rote memorization, and corporeal punishment were two predominant features of the seventeenth century English educational system. Locke saw little use for either. Instead, he emphasized the importance of teaching practical knowledge. He recognized that children learn best when they are engaged with the subject matter. Locke also foreshadowed some contemporary pedagogical views by suggesting that children should be allowed some self-direction in their course of study and should have the ability to pursue their interests.

Locke believed it was important to take great care in educating the young. He recognized that habits and prejudices formed in youth could be very hard to break in later life. Thus, much of Some Thoughts Concerning Education focuses on morality and the best ways to inculcate virtue and industry. Locke rejected authoritarian approaches. Instead, he favored methods that would help children to understand the difference between right and wrong and to cultivate a moral sense of their own.

7. Locke’s Influence

The Essay was quickly recognized as an important philosophical contribution both by its admirers and by its critics. Before long it had been incorporated into the curriculum at Oxford and Cambridge and its translation into both Latin and French garnered it an audience on the Continent as well. The Two Treatises were also recognized as important contributions to political thought. While the work had some success in England among those favorably disposed to the Glorious Revolution, its primary impact was abroad. During the American Revolution (and to a lesser extent, during the French Revolution) Locke’s views were often appealed to by those seeking to establish more representative forms of government.

Related to this last point, Locke came to be seen, alongside his friend Newton, as an embodiment of Enlightenment values and ideals. Newtonian science would lay bare the workings of nature and lead to important technological advances. Lockean philosophy would lay bare the workings of men’s minds and lead to important reforms in law and government. Voltaire played an instrumental role in shaping this legacy for Locke and worked hard to publicize Locke’s views on reason, toleration, and limited government. Locke also came to be seen as an inspiration for the Deist movement. Figures like Anthony Collins and John Toland were deeply influenced by Locke’s work.

Locke is often recognized as the founder of British Empiricism and it is true that Locke laid the foundation for much of English-language philosophy in the 18th and early 19th centuries. But those who followed in his footsteps were not unquestioning followers. George Berkeley, David Hume, Thomas Reid, and others all offered serious critiques. In recent decades, readers have attempted to offer more charitable reconstructions of Locke’s philosophy. Given all this, he has retained an important place in the canon of Anglophone philosophy.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Locke’s Works

  • Laslett, P. [ed.] 1988. Two Treatises of Government. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Locke, J. 1823. The Works of John Locke. London: Printed for T. Tegg (10 volumes).
  • Locke, J. The Clarendon Edition of the Works of John Locke, Oxford University Press, 2015. This edition includes the following volumes:
  • Nidditch, P. [ed.] 1975. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Nidditch, P. and G.A.J. Rogers [eds.] 1990. Drafts for the Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Yolton, J.W. and J.S. Yolton. [eds.] 1989. Some Thoughts Concerning Education.
  • Higgins-Biddle, J.C. [ed.] 1999. The Reasonableness of Christianity.
  • Milton, J.R. and P. Milton. [eds.] 2006. An Essay Concerning Toleration.
  • de Beer, E.S. [ed.] 1976-1989. The Correspondence of John Locke. (8 volumes).
  • von Leyden, W. [ed.] 1954. Essays on the Law of Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

b. Recommended Reading

The following are recommendations for further reading on Locke. Each work has a brief statement indicating the contents

  • Anstey, P. 2011. John Locke & Natural Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • A thorough examination of Locke’s scientific and medical thinking.
  • Ayers, M.  1993. Locke: Epistemology and Ontology. New York: Routledge.
  • A classic in Locke studies. Explores philosophical topics in the Essay and discusses Locke’s project as a whole. One volume on epistemology and one on metaphysics.
  • Chappell, V. 1994. The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on all aspects of Locke’s thought.
  • LoLordo, A. 2012. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An exploration and discussion of themes at the intersection of Locke’s moral and political thought. Focuses particularly on agency, personhood, and rationality.
  • Lowe, E.J. 2005. Locke. New York: Routledge.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1976. Problems from Locke.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Uses Locke’s work to raise and discuss a number of philosophical issues and puzzles.
  • Newman, L. 2007. The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on specific issues in Locke’s Essay.
  • Pyle, A.J. 2013. Locke. London: Polity.
  • An excellent and brief introduction to Locke’s thought and historical context. A very good place to start for beginners.
  • Rickless, S. 2014. Locke. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Stuart, M. 2013. Locke’s Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An in-depth treatment of metaphysical issues and problems in the Essay.
  • Waldron, J. 2002. God, Locke, and Equality: Christian Foundation of Locke’s Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • An examination of some key issues in Locke’s political thought.
  • Woolhouse, R. 2009. Locke: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • The best and most recent biography of Locke’s life.


Author Information

Patrick J. Connolly
Iowa State University
U. S. A.

Immanuel Kant

kant2Towards the end of his most influential work, Critique of Pure Reason(1781/1787), Kant argues that all philosophy ultimately aims at answering these three questions: “What can I know? What should I do? What may I hope?” The book appeared at the beginning of the most productive period of his career, and by the end of his life Kant had worked out systematic, revolutionary, and often profound answers to these questions.

At the foundation of Kant’s system is the doctrine of “transcendental idealism,” which emphasizes a distinction between what we can experience (the natural, observable world) and what we cannot (“supersensible” objects such as God and the soul). Kant argued that we can only have knowledge of things we can experience. Accordingly, in answer to the question, “What can I know?” Kant replies that we can know the natural, observable world, but we cannot, however, have answers to many of the deepest questions of metaphysics.

Kant’s ethics are organized around the notion of a “categorical imperative,” which is a universal ethical principle stating that one should always respect the humanity in others, and that one should only act in accordance with rules that could hold for everyone. Kant argued that the moral law is a truth of reason, and hence that all rational creatures are bound by the same moral law. Thus in answer to the question, “What should I do?” Kant replies that we should act rationally, in accordance with a universal moral law.

Kant also argued that his ethical theory requires belief in free will, God, and the immortality of the soul. Although we cannot have knowledge of these things, reflection on the moral law leads to a justified belief in them, which amounts to a kind rational faith. Thus in answer to the question, “What may I hope?” Kant replies that we may hope that our souls are immortal and that there really is a God who designed the world in accordance with principles of justice.

In addition to these three focal points, Kant also made lasting contributions to nearly all areas of philosophy. His aesthetic theory remains influential among art critics. His theory of knowledge is required reading for many branches of analytic philosophy. The cosmopolitanism behind his political theory colors discourse about globalization and international relations. And some of his scientific contributions are even considered intellectual precursors to several ideas in contemporary cosmology.

This article presents an overview of these and other of Kant’s most important philosophical contributions. It follows standard procedures for citing Kant’s works. Passages from Critique of Pure Reason are cited by reference to page numbers in both the 1781 and 1787 editions. Thus “(A805/B833)” refers to page 805 in the 1781 edition and 833 in the 1787 edition. References to the rest of Kant’s works refer to the volume and page number of the official Deutsche Akademie editions of Kant’s works. Thus “(5:162)” refers to volume 5, page 162 of those editions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Metaphysics and Epistemology
    1. Pre-Critical Thought
    2. Dogmatic Slumber, Synthetic A Priori Knowledge, and the Copernican Shift
    3. The Cognitive Faculties and Their Representations
    4. Transcendental Idealism
      1. The Ideality of Space and Time
      2. Appearances and Things in Themselves
    5. The Deduction of the Categories
    6. Theory of Experience
    7. Critique of Transcendent Metaphysics
      1. The Soul (Paralogisms of Pure Reason)
      2. The World (Antinomies of Pure Reason)
      3. God (Ideal of Pure Reason)
  3. Philosophy of Mathematics
  4. Natural Science
    1. Physics
    2. Other Scientific Contributions
  5. Moral Theory
    1. The Good Will and Duty
    2. The Categorical Imperative
    3. Postulates of Practical Reason
  6. Political Theory and Theory of Human History
    1. Human History and the Age of Enlightenment
    2. Political Theory
    3. Perpetual Peace
  7. Theory of Art and Beauty
    1. The Beautiful and the Sublime
    2. Theory of Art
    3. Relation to Moral Theory
  8. Pragmatic Anthropology
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Kant was born in 1724 in the Prussian city of Königsberg (now Kaliningrad in Russia). His parents – Johann Georg and Anna Regina – were pietists. Although they raised Kant in this tradition (an austere offshoot of Lutheranism that emphasized humility and divine grace), he does not appear ever to have been very sympathetic to this kind of religious devotion. As a youth, he attended the Collegium Fridericianum in Königsberg, after which he attended the University of Königsberg. Although he initially focused his studies on the classics, philosophy soon caught and held his attention. The rationalism of Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) and Christian Wolff (1679-1754) was most influential on him during these early years, but Kant was also introduced to Isaac Newton’s (1642-1727) writings during this time.

His mother had died in 1737, and after his father’s death in 1746 Kant left the University to work as a private tutor for several families in the countryside around the city. He returned to the University in 1754 to teach as a Privatdozent, which meant that he was paid directly by individual students, rather than by the University. He supported himself in this way until 1770. Kant published many essays and other short works during this period. He made minor scientific contributions in astronomy, physics, and earth science, and wrote philosophical treatises engaging with the Leibnizian-Wolffian traditions of the day (many of these are discussed below). Kant’s primary professional goal during this period was to eventually attain the position of Professor of Logic and Metaphysics at Königsberg. He finally succeeded in 1770 (at the age of 46) when he completed his second dissertation (the first had been published in 1755), which is now referred to as the Inaugural Dissertation.

Commentators divide Kant’s career into the “pre-critical” period before 1770 and the “critical” period after. After the publication of the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant published hardly anything for more than a decade (this period is referred to as his “silent decade”). However, this was anything but a fallow period for Kant. After discovering and being shaken by the radical skepticism of Hume’s empiricism in the early 1770s, Kant undertook a massive project to respond to Hume. He realized that this response would require a complete reorientation of the most fundamental approaches to metaphysics and epistemology. Although it took much longer than initially planned, his project came to fruition in 1781 with the publication of the first edition of Critique of Pure Reason

The 1780s would be the most productive years of Kant’s career. In addition to writing the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783) as a sort of introduction to the Critique, Kant wrote important works in ethics (Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, 1785, and Critique of Practical Reason, 1788), he applied his theoretical philosophy to Newtonian physical theory (Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, 1786), and he substantially revised the Critique of Pure Reason in 1787. Kant capped the decade with the publication of the third and final critique, Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790).

Although the products of the 1780s are the works for which Kant is best known, he continued to publish philosophical writings through the 1790s as well. Of note during this period are Religion within the Bounds of Mere Reason (1793), Towards Perpetual Peace (1795), Metaphysics of Morals (1797), and Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798). The Religion was attended with some controversy, and Kant was ultimately led to promise the King of Prussia (Friedrich Wilhelm II) not to publish anything else on religion. (Kant considered the promise null and void after the king died in 1797.) During his final years, he devoted himself to completing the critical project with one final bridge to physical science. Unfortunately, the encroaching dementia of Kant’s final years prevented him from completing this book (partial drafts are published under the title Opus Postumum).

Kant never married and there are many stories that paint him as a quirky but dour eccentric. These stories do not do him justice. He was beloved by his friends and colleagues. He was consistently generous to all those around him, including his servants. He was universally considered a lively and engaging dinner guest and (later in life) host. And he was a devoted and popular teacher throughout the five decades he spent in the classroom. Although he had hoped for a small, private ceremony, when he died in 1804, age 79, his funeral was attended by the thousands who wished to pay their respects to “the sage of Königsberg.”

2. Metaphysics and Epistemology

The most important element of Kant’s mature metaphysics and epistemology is his doctrine of transcendental idealism, which received its fullest discussion in Critique of Pure Reason (1781/87). Transcendental idealism is the thesis that the empirical world that we experience (the “phenomenal” world of “appearances”) is to be distinguished from the world of things as they are in themselves. The most significant aspect of this distinction is that while the empirical world exists in space and time, things in themselves are neither spatial nor temporal. Transcendental idealism has wide-ranging consequences. On the positive side, Kant takes transcendental idealism to entail an “empirical realism,” according to which humans have direct epistemic access to the natural, physical world and can even have a priori cognition of basic features of all possible experienceable objects. On the negative side, Kant argues that we cannot have knowledge of things in themselves. Further, since traditional metaphysics deals with things in themselves, answers to the questions of traditional metaphysics (for example, regarding God or free will) can never be answered by human minds.

This section addresses the development of Kant’s metaphysics and epistemology and then summarizes the most important arguments and conclusions of Kant’s theory.

a. Pre-Critical Thought

Critique of Pure Reason, the book that would alter the course of western philosophy, was written by a man already far into his career. Unlike the later “critical period” Kant, the philosophical output of the early Kant was fully enmeshed in the German rationalist tradition, which was dominated at the time by the writings of Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) and Christian Wolff (1679-1754). Nevertheless, many of Kant’s concerns during the pre-critical period anticipate important aspects of his mature thought.

Kant’s first purely philosophical work was the New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition (1755). The first parts of this long essay present criticisms and revisions of the Wolffian understanding of the basic principles of metaphysics, especially the Principles of Identity (whatever is, is, and whatever is not, is not), of Contradiction (nothing can both be and not be), and of Sufficient Reason (nothing is true without a reason why it is true). In the final part, Kant defends two original principles of metaphysics. According to the “Principle of Succession,” all change in objects requires the mutual interaction of a plurality of substances. This principle is a metaphysical analogue of Newton’s principle of action and reaction, and it anticipates Kant’s argument in the Third Analogy of Experience from Critique of Pure Reason (see 2f below). According to the “Principle of Coexistence,” multiple substances can only be said to coexist within the same world if the unity of that world is grounded in the intellect of God. Although Kant would later claim that we can never have metaphysical cognition of this sort of relation between God and the world (not least of all because we can’t even know that God exists), he would nonetheless continue to be occupied with the question of how multiple distinct substances can constitute a single, unified world.

In the Physical Monadology (1756), Kant attempts to provide a metaphysical account of the basic constitution of material substance in terms of “monads.” Leibniz and Wolff had held that monads are the simple, atomic substances that constitute matter. Kant follows Wolff in rejecting Leibniz’s claim that monads are mindlike and that they do not interact with each other. The novel aspect of Kant’s account lies in his claim that each monad possesses a degree of both attractive and repulsive force, and that monads fill determinate volumes of space because of the interactions between these monads as they compress each other through their opposed repulsive forces. Thirty years later, in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786), Kant would develop the theory that matter must be understood in terms of interacting attractive and repulsive forces. The primary difference between the later view and the earlier is that Kant no longer appeals to monads, or simple substances at all (transcendental idealism rules out the possibility of simplest substances as constituents of matter; see 2gii below).

The final publication of Kant’s pre-critical period was On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World, also referred to as the Inaugural Dissertation (1770), since it marked Kant’s appointment as Königsberg’s Professor of Logic and Metaphysics. Although Kant had not yet had the final crucial insights that would lead to the development of transcendental idealism, many of the important elements of his mature metaphysics are prefigured here. Two aspects of the Inaugural Dissertation are especially worth noting. First, in a break from his predecessors, Kant distinguishes two fundamental faculties of the mind: sensibility, which represents the world through singular “intuitions,” and understanding, which represents the world through general “concepts.” In the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant argues that sensibility represents the sensible world of “phenomena” while the understanding represents an intelligible world of “noumena.” The critical period Kant will deny that we can have any determinate knowledge of noumena, and that knowledge of phenomena requires the cooperation of sensibility and understanding together. Second, in describing the “form” of the sensible world, Kant argues that space and time are “not something objective and real,” but are rather “subjective and ideal” (2:403). The claim that space and time pertain to things only as they appear, not as they are in themselves, will be one of the central theses of Kant’s mature transcendental idealism.

b. Dogmatic Slumber, Synthetic A Priori Knowledge, and the Copernican Shift

Although the early Kant showed a complete willingness to dissent from many important aspects of the Wolffian orthodoxy of the time, Kant continued to take for granted the basic rationalist assumption that metaphysical cognition was possible. In a retrospective remark from the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783), Kant says that his faith in this rationalist assumption was shaken by David Hume (1711-1776), whose skepticism regarding the possibility of knowledge of causal necessary connections awoke Kant from his “dogmatic slumber” (4:260). Hume argued that we can never have knowledge of necessary connections between causes and effects because such knowledge can neither be given through the senses, nor derived a priori as conceptual truths. Kant realized that Hume’s problem was a serious one because his skepticism about knowledge of the necessity of the connection between cause and effect generalized to all metaphysical knowledge pertaining to necessity, not just causation specifically. For instance, there is the question why mathematical truths necessarily hold true in the natural world, or the question whether we can know that a being (God) exists necessarily.

The solution to Hume’s skepticism, which would form the basis of the critical philosophy, was twofold. The first part of Kant’s solution was to agree with Hume that metaphysical knowledge (such as knowledge of causation) is neither given through the senses, nor is it known a priori through conceptual analysis. Kant argued, however, that there is a third kind of knowledge which is a priori, yet which is not known simply by analyzing concepts. He referred to this as “synthetic a priori knowledge.” Where analytic judgments are justified by the semantic relations between the concepts they mention (for example, “all bachelors are unmarried”), synthetic judgments are justified by their conformity to the given object that they describe (for example, “this ball right here is red”). The puzzle posed by the notion of synthetic a priori knowledge is that it would require that an object be presented to the mind, but not be given in sensory experience.

The second part of Kant’s solution is to explain how synthetic a priori knowledge could be possible. He describes his key insight on this matter as a “Copernican” shift in his thinking about the epistemic relation between the mind and the world. Copernicus had realized that it only appeared as though the sun and stars revolved around us, and that we could have knowledge of the way the solar system really was if we took into account the fact that the sky looks the way it does because we perceivers are moving. Analogously, Kant realized that we must reject the belief that the way things appear corresponds to the way things are in themselves. Furthermore, he argued that the objects of knowledge can only ever be things as they appear, not as they are in themselves. Appealing to this new approach to metaphysics and epistemology, Kant argued that we must investigate the most basic structures of experience (that is, the structures of the way things appear to us), because the basic structures of experience will coincide with the basic structures of any objects that could possibly be experienced. In other words, if it is only possible to have experience of an object if the object conforms to the conditions of experience, then knowing the conditions of experience will give us knowledge – synthetic a priori knowledge in fact – of every possible object of experience. Kant overcomes Hume’s skepticism by showing that we can have synthetic a priori knowledge of objects in general when we take as the object of our investigation the very form of a possible object of experience. Critique of Pure Reason is an attempt to work through all of the important details of this basic philosophical strategy.

c. The Cognitive Faculties and Their Representations

Kant’s theory of the mind is organized around an account of the mind’s powers, its “cognitive faculties.” One of Kant’s central claims is that the cognitive capacities of the mind depend on two basic and fundamentally distinct faculties. First, there is “sensibility.” Sensibility is a passive faculty because its job is to receive representations through the affection of objects on the senses. Through sensibility, objects are “given” to the mind. Second, there is “understanding,” which is an active faculty whose job is to “think” (that is, apply concepts to) the objects given through sensibility.

The most basic type of representation of sensibility is what Kant calls an “intuition.” An intuition is a representation that refers directly to a singular individual object. There are two types of intuitions. Pure intuitions are a priori representations of space and time themselves (see 2d1 below). Empirical intuitions are a posteriori representations that refer to specific empirical objects in the world. In addition to possessing a spatiotemporal “form,” empirical intuitions also involve sensation, which Kant calls the “matter” of intuition (and of experience generally). (Without sensations, the mind could never have thoughts about real things, only possible ones.) We have empirical intuitions both of objects in the physical world (“outer intuitions”) and objects in our own minds (“inner intuitions”).

The most basic type of representation of understanding is the “concept.” Unlike an intuition, a concept is a representation that refers generally to indefinitely many objects. (For instance, the concept ‘cat’ on its own could refer to any and all cats, but not to any one in particular.) Concepts refer to their objects only indirectly because they depend on intuitions for reference to particular objects. As with intuitions, there are two basic types of concepts. Pure concepts are a priori representations and they characterize the most basic logical structure of the mind. Kant calls these concepts “categories.” Empirical concepts are a posteriori representations, and they are formed on the basis of sensory experience with the world. Concepts are combined by the understanding into “judgments,” which are the smallest units of knowledge. I can only have full cognition of an object in the world once I have, first, had an empirical intuition of the object, second, conceptualized this object in some way, and third, formed my conceptualization of the intuited object into a judgment. This means that both sensibility and understanding must work in cooperation for knowledge to be possible. As Kant expresses it, “Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (A51/B75).

There are two other important cognitive faculties that must be mentioned. The first is transcendental “imagination,” which mediates between sensibility and understanding. Kant calls this faculty “blind” because we do not have introspective access to its operations. Kant says that we can at least know that it is responsible for forming intuitions in such a way that it is possible for the understanding to apply concepts to them. The other is “reason,” which operates in a way similar to the understanding, but which operates independently of the senses. While understanding combines the data of the senses into judgments, reason combines understanding’s judgments together into one coherent, unified, systematic whole. Reason is not satisfied with mere disconnected bits of knowledge. Reason wants all knowledge to form a system of knowledge. Reason is also the faculty responsible for the “illusions” of transcendent metaphysics (see 2g below).

d. Transcendental Idealism

Transcendental idealism is a theory about the relation between the mind and its objects. Three fundamental theses make up this theory: first, there is a distinction between appearances (things as they appear) and things as they are in themselves. Second, space and time are a priori, subjective conditions on the possibility of experience, and hence they pertain only to appearances, not to things in themselves. Third, we can have determinate cognition of only of things that can be experienced, hence only of appearances, not things in themselves.

A quick remark on the term “transcendental idealism” is in order. Kant typically uses the term “transcendental” when he wants to emphasize that something is a condition on the possibility of experience. So for instance, the chapter titled “Transcendental Analytic of Concepts” deals with the concepts without which cognition of an object would be impossible.  Kant uses the term “idealism” to indicate that the objects of experience are mind-dependent (although the precise sense of this mind-dependence is controversial; see 2d2 below). Hence, transcendental idealism is the theory that it is a condition on the possibility of experience that the objects of experience be in some sense mind-dependent.

i. The Ideality of Space and Time

Kant argues that space and time are a priori, subjective conditions on the possibility of experience, that is, that they are transcendentally ideal. Kant grounds the distinction between appearances and things in themselves on the realization that, as subjective conditions on experience, space and time could only characterize things as they appear, not as they are in themselves. Further, the claim that we can only know appearances (not things in themselves) is a consequence of the claims that we can only know objects that conform to the conditions of experience, and that only spatiotemporal appearances conform to these conditions. Given the systematic importance of this radical claim, what were Kant’s arguments for it? What follows are some of Kant’s most important arguments for the thesis.

One argument has to do with the relation between sensations and space. Kant argues that sensations on their own are not spatial, but that they (or arguably the objects they correspond to) are represented in space, “outside and next to one another” (A23/B34). Hence, the ability to sense objects in space presupposes the a priori representation of space, which entails that space is merely ideal, hence not a property of things in themselves.

Another argument that Kant makes repeatedly during the critical period can be called the “argument from geometry.” Its two premises are, first, that the truths of geometry are necessary truths, and thus a priori truths, and second, that the truths of geometry are synthetic (because these truths cannot be derived from an analysis of the meanings of geometrical concepts). If geometry, which is the study of the structure of space, is synthetic a priori, then its object – space – must be a mere a priori representation and not something that pertains to things in themselves. (Kant’s theory of mathematical cognition is discussed further in 3b below.)

Many commentators have found these arguments less than satisfying because they depend on the questionable assumption that if the representations of space and time are a priori they thereby cannot be properties of things in themselves. “Why can’t it be both?” many want to ask. A stronger argument appears in Kant’s discussion of the First and Second Antinomies of Pure Reason (discussed below, 2g2). There Kant argues that if space and time were things in themselves or even properties of things in themselves, then one could prove that space and time both are and are not infinitely large, and that matter in space both is and is not infinitely divisible. In other words, the assumption that space and time are transcendentally real instead of transcendentally ideal leads to a contradiction, and thus space and time must be transcendentally ideal.

ii. Appearances and Things in Themselves

How Kant’s distinction between appearances and things in themselves should be understood is one of the most controversial topics in the literature. It is a question of central importance because how one understands this distinction determines how one will understand the entire nature of Kantian idealism. The following briefly summarizes the main interpretive options, but it does not take a stand on which is correct.

According to “two-world” interpretations, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is to be understood in metaphysical and ontological terms. Appearances (and hence the entire physical world that we experience) comprise one set of entities, and things in themselves are an ontologically distinct set of entities. Although things in themselves may somehow cause us to have experience of appearances, the appearances we experience are not things in themselves.

According to “one-world” or “two-aspect” interpretations, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is to be understood in epistemological terms. Appearances are ontologically the very same things as things in themselves, and the phrase “in themselves” simply means “not considered in terms of their epistemic relation to human perceivers.”

A common objection against two-world interpretations is that they may make Kant’s theory too similar to Berkeley’s immaterialist idealism (an association from which Kant vehemently tried to distance himself), and they seem to ignore Kant’s frequent characterization of the appearance/thing in itself distinction in terms of different epistemic standpoints. And a common objection against one-world interpretations is that they may trivialize some of the otherwise revolutionary aspects of Kant’s theory, and they seem to ignore Kant’s frequent characterization of the appearance/thing in itself distinction in seemingly metaphysical terms. There have been attempts at interpretations that are intermediate between these two options. For instance, some have argued that Kant only acknowledges one world, but that the appearance/thing in itself distinction is nevertheless metaphysical, not merely epistemological.

e. The Deduction of the Categories

After establishing the ideality of space and time and the distinction between appearances and things in themselves, Kant goes on to show how it is possible to have a priori cognition of the necessary features of appearances. Cognizing appearances requires more than mere knowledge of their sensible form (space and time); it also requires that we be able to apply certain concepts (for example, the concept of causation) to appearances. Kant identifies the most basic concepts that we can use to think about objects as the “pure concepts of understanding,” or the “categories.”

There are twelve categories in total, and they fall into four groups of three:














The task of the chapter titled “Transcendental Deduction of the Categories” is to show that these categories can and must be applied in some way to any object that could possibly be an object of experience. The argument of the Transcendental Deduction is one of the most important moments in the Critique, but it is also one of the most difficult, complex, and controversial arguments in the book. Hence, it will not be possible to reconstruct the argument in any detail here. Instead, Kant’s most important claims and moves in the Deduction are described.

Kant’s argument turns on conceptions of self-consciousness (or what he calls “apperception”) as a condition on the possibility of experiencing the world as a unified whole. Kant takes it to be uncontroversial that we can be aware of our representations as our representations. It is not just that I can have the thoughts ‘P’ or ‘Q’; I am also always able to ascribe these thoughts to myself: ‘I think P’ and ‘I think Q’. Further, we are also able to recognize that it is the same I that does the thinking in both cases. Thus, we can recognize that ‘I think both P and Q’. In general, all of our experience is unified because it can be ascribed to the one and same I, and so this unity of experience depends on the unity of the self-conscious I. Kant next asks what conditions must obtain in order for this unity of self-consciousness to be possible. His answer is that we must be able to differentiate between the I that does the thinking and the object that we think about. That is, we must be able to distinguish between subjective and objective elements in our experience. If we could not make such a distinction, then all experience would just be so many disconnected mental happenings: everything would be subjective and there would be no “unity of apperception” that stands over and against the various objects represented by the I. So next Kant needs to explain how we are able to differentiate between the subjective and objective elements of experience. His answer is that a representation is objective when the subject is necessitated in representing the object in a certain way, that is, when it is not up to the free associative powers of my imagination to determine how I represent it. For instance, whether I think a painting is attractive or whether it calls to mind an instance from childhood depends on the associative activity of my own imagination; but the size of the canvas and the chemical composition of the pigments is not up to me: insofar as I represent these as objective features of the painting, I am necessitated in representing them in a certain way. In order for a representational content to be necessitated in this way, according to Kant, is for it to be subject to a “rule.” The relevant rules that Kant has in mind are the conditions something must satisfy in order for it to be represented as an object at all. And these conditions are precisely the concepts laid down in the schema of the categories, which are the concepts of an “object in general.” Hence, if I am to have experience at all, I must conceptualize objects in terms of the a priori categories.

Kant’s argument in the Deduction is a “transcendental argument”: Kant begins with a premise accepted by everyone, but then asks what conditions must have been met in order for this premise to be true. Kant assumed that we have a unified experience of the many objects populating the world. This unified experience depends on the unity of apperception. The unity of apperception enables the subject to distinguish between subjective and objective elements in experience. This ability, in turn, depends on representing objects in accordance with rules, and the rules in question are the categories. Hence, the only way we can explain the fact that we have experience at all is by appeal to the fact that the categories apply to the objects of experience.

It is worth emphasizing how truly radical the conclusion of the Transcendental Deduction is. Kant takes himself to have shown that all of nature is subject to the rules laid down by the categories. But these categories are a priori: they originate in the mind. This means that the order and regularity we encounter in the natural world is made possible by the mind’s own construction of nature and its order. Thus the conclusion of the Transcendental Deduction parallels the conclusion of the Transcendental Aesthetic: where the latter had shown that the forms of sensibility (space and time) originate in the mind and are imposed on the world, the former shows that the forms of understanding (the categories) also originate in the mind and are imposed on the world.

f. Theory of Experience

The Transcendental Deduction showed that it is necessary for us to make use of the categories in experience, but also that we are justified in making use of them. In the following series of chapters (together labeled the Analytic of Principles) Kant attempts to leverage the results of the Deduction and prove that there are transcendentally necessary laws that every possible object of experience must obey. He refers to these as “principles of pure understanding.” These principles are synthetic a priori in the sense defined above (see 2b), and they are transcendental conditions on the possibility of experience.

The first two principles correspond to the categories of quantity and quality. First, Kant argues that every object of experience must have a determinate spatial shape and size and a determinate temporal duration (except mental objects, which have no spatial determinations). Second, Kant argues that every object of experience must contain a “matter” that fills out the object’s extensive magnitude. This matter must be describable as an “intensive magnitude.” Extensive magnitudes are represented through the intuition of the object (the form of the representation) and intensive magnitudes are represented by the sensations that fill out the intuition (the matter of the representation).

The next three principles are discussed in an important, lengthy chapter called the Analogies of Experience. They derive from the relational categories: substance, causality, and community. According to the First Analogy, experience will always involve objects that must be represented as substances. “Substance” here is to be understood in terms of an object that persists permanently as a “substratum” and which is the bearer of impermanent “accidents.” According to the Second Analogy, every event must have a cause. One event is said to be the cause of another when the second event follows the first in accordance with a rule. And according to the Third Analogy (which presupposes the first two), all substances stand in relations of reciprocal interaction with each other. That is, any two pieces of material substance will effect some degree of causal influence on each other, even if they are far apart.

The principles of the Analogies of Experience are important metaphysical principles, and if Kant’s arguments for them are successful, they mark significant advances in the metaphysical investigation of nature. The First Analogy is a form of the principle of the conservation of matter: it shows that matter can never be created or annihilated by natural means, it can only be altered. The Second Analogy is a version of the principle of sufficient reason applied to experience (causes being sufficient reasons for their effects), and it represents Kant’s refutation of Hume’s skepticism regarding causation. Hume had argued that we can never have knowledge of necessary connections between events; rather, we can only perceive certain types of events to be constantly conjoined with other types of events. In arguing that events follow each other in accordance with rules, Kant has shown how we can have knowledge of necessary connections between events above and beyond their mere constant conjunction. Lastly, Kant probably intended the Third Analogy to establish a transcendental, a priori basis for something like Newton’s law of universal gravitation, which says that no matter how far apart two objects are they will exert some degree of gravitational influence on each other.

The Postulates of Empirical Thinking in General contains the final set of principles of pure understanding and they derive from the modal categories (possibility, actuality, necessity). The Postulates define the different ways to represent the modal status of objects, that is, what it is for an object of experience to be possible, actual, or necessary.

The most important passage from the Postulates chapter is the Refutation of Idealism, which is a refutation of external world skepticism that Kant added to the 1787 edition of the Critique. Kant had been annoyed by reviews of the first edition that unfavorably compared his transcendental idealism with Berkeley’s immaterialist idealism. In the Refutation, Kant argues that his system entails not just that an external (that is, spatial) world is possible (which Berkeley denied), but that we can know it is real (which Descartes and others questioned). Kant’s argumentative strategy in the Refutation is ingenious but controversial. Where the skeptics assume that we have knowledge of the states of our own minds, but say that we cannot be certain that an external world corresponds to these states, Kant turns the tables and argues that we would not have knowledge of the states of our own minds (specifically, the temporal order in which our ideas occur) if we were not simultaneously aware of permanent substances in space, outside of the mind. The precise structure of Kant’s argument, as well as the question how successful it is, continues to be a matter of heated debate in the literature.

g. Critique of Transcendent Metaphysics

One of the most important upshots of Kant’s theory of experience is that it is possible to have knowledge of the world because the world as we experience it conforms to the conditions on the possibility of experience. Accordingly, Kant holds that there can be knowledge of an object only if it is possible for that object to be given in an experience. This aspect of the epistemological condition of the human subject entails that there are important areas of inquiry about which we would like to have knowledge, but cannot. Most importantly, Kant argued that transcendent metaphysics, that is, philosophical inquiry into “supersensible” objects that are not a part of the empirical world, marks a philosophical dead end. (Note: There is a subtle but important difference between the terms “transcendental” and “transcendent” for Kant. “Transcendental” describes conditions on the possibility of experience. “Transcendent” describes unknowable objects in the “noumenal” realm of things in themselves.)

Kant calls the basic concepts of metaphysical inquiry “ideas.” Unlike concepts of the understanding, which correspond to possible objects that can be given in experience, ideas are concepts of reason, and they do not correspond to possible objects of experience. The three most important ideas with which Kant is concerned in the Transcendental Dialectic are the soul, the world (considered as a totality), and God. The peculiar thing about these ideas of reason is that reason is led by its very structure to posit objects corresponding to these ideas. It cannot help but do this because reason’s job is to unify cognitions into a systematic whole, and it finds that it needs these ideas of the soul, the world, and God, in order to complete this systematic unification. Kant refers to reason’s inescapable tendency to posit unexperienceable and hence unknowable objects corresponding to these ideas as “transcendental illusion.”

Kant presents his analysis of transcendental illusion and his critique of transcendent metaphysics in the series of chapters titled “Transcendental Dialectic,” which takes up the majority of the second half of Critique of Pure Reason. This section summarizes Kant’s most important arguments from the Dialectic.

i. The Soul (Paralogisms of Pure Reason)

Kant addresses the metaphysics of the soul – an inquiry he refers to as “rational psychology” – in the Paralogisms of Pure Reason. Rational psychology, as Kant describes it, is the attempt to prove metaphysical theses about the nature of the soul through an analysis of the simple proposition, “I think.” Many of Kant’s rationalist predecessors and contemporaries had thought that reflection on the notion of the “I” in the proposition “I think” would reveal that the I is necessarily a substance (which would mean that the I is a soul), an indivisible unity (which some would use to prove the immortality of the soul), self-identical (which is relevant to questions regarding personal identity), and distinct from the external world (which can lead to external-world skepticism). Kant argues that such reasoning is the result of transcendental illusion.

Transcendental illusion in rational psychology arises when the mere thought of the I in the proposition “I think” is mistaken for a cognition of the I as an object. (A cognition involves both intuition and concept, while a mere thought involves only concept.) For instance, consider the question whether we can cognize the I as a substance (that is, as a soul). On the one hand, something is cognized as a substance when it is represented only as the subject of predication and is never itself the predicate of some other subject. The I of “I think” is always represented as subject (the I’s various thoughts are its predicates). On the other hand, something can only be cognized as a substance when it is given as a persistent object in an intuition (see 2f above), and there can be no intuition of the I itself. Hence although we cannot help but think of the I as a substantial soul, we can never have cognition of the I as a substance, and hence knowledge of the existence and nature of the soul is impossible.

ii. The World (Antinomies of Pure Reason)

The Antinomies of Pure Reason deal with “rational cosmology,” that is, with metaphysical inquiry into the nature of the cosmos considered as a totality. An “antinomy” is a conflict of reason with itself. Antinomies arise when reason seems to be able to prove two opposed and mutually contradictory propositions with apparent certainty. Kant discusses four antinomies in the first Critique (he uncovers other antinomies in later writings as well). The First Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that the universe is both finite and infinite in space and time. The Second Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that matter both is and is not infinitely divisible into ever smaller parts. The Third Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that free will cannot be a causally efficacious part of the world (because all of nature is deterministic) and yet that it must be such a cause. And the Fourth Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that there is and there is not a necessary being (which some would identify with God).

In all four cases, Kant attempts to resolve these conflicts of reason with itself by appeal to transcendental idealism. The claim that space and time are not features of things in themselves is used to resolve the First and Second Antinomies. Since the empirical world in space and time is identified with appearances, and since the world as a totality can never itself be given as a single appearance, there is no determinate fact of the matter regarding the size of the universe: It is neither determinately finite nor determinately infinite; rather, it is indefinitely large. Similarly, matter has neither simplest atoms (or “monads”) nor is it infinitely divided; rather, it is indefinitely divisible.

The distinction between appearances and things in themselves is used to resolve the Third and Fourth Antinomies. Although every empirical event experienced within the realm of appearance has a deterministic natural cause, it is at least logically possible that freedom can be a causally efficacious power at the level of things in themselves. And although every empirical object experienced within the realm of appearance is a contingently existing entity, it is logically possible that there is a necessary being outside the realm of appearance which grounds the existence of the contingent beings within the realm of appearance. It must be kept in mind that Kant has not claimed to demonstrate the existence of a transcendent free will or a transcendent necessary being: Kant denies the possibility of knowledge of things in themselves. Instead, Kant only takes himself to have shown that the existence of such entities is logically possible. In his moral theory, however, Kant will offer an argument for the actuality of freedom (see 5c below).

iii. God (Ideal of Pure Reason)

The Ideal of Pure Reason addresses the idea of God and argues that it is impossible to prove the existence of God. The argumentation in the Ideal of Pure Reason was anticipated in Kant’s The Only Possible Argument in Support of the Existence of God (1763), making this aspect of Kant’s mature thought one of the most significant remnants of the pre-critical period.

Kant identifies the idea of God with the idea of an ens realissimum, or “most real being.” This most real being is also considered by reason to be a necessary being, that is, something which exists necessarily instead of merely contingently. Reason is led to posit the idea of such a being when it reflects on its conceptions of finite beings with limited reality and infers that the reality of finite beings must derive from and depend on the reality of the most infinitely perfect being. Of course, the fact that reason necessarily thinks of a most real, necessary being does not entail that such a being exists. Kant argues that there are only three possible arguments for the existence of such a being, and that none is successful.

According to the ontological argument for the existence of God (versions of which were proposed by St. Anselm (1033-1109) and Descartes (1596-1650), among others), God is the only being whose essence entails its existence. Kant famously objects that this argument mistakenly treats existence as a “real predicate.” According to Kant, when I make an assertion of the form “x is necessarily F,” all I can mean is that “if x exists, then x must be F.” Thus when proponents of the ontological argument claim that the idea of God entails that “God necessarily exists,” all they can mean is that “if God exists, then God exists,” which is an empty tautology.

Kant also offers lengthy criticisms of the cosmological argument (the existence of contingent beings entails the existence of a necessary being) and the physico-theological argument, which is also referred to as the “argument from design” (the order and purposiveness in the empirical world can only be explained by a divine creator). Kant argues that both of these implicitly depend on the argumentation of the ontological argument pertaining to necessary existence, and since it fails, they fail as well.

Although Kant argues in the Transcendental Dialectic that we cannot have cognition of the soul, of freedom of the will, nor of God, in his ethical writings he will complicate this story and argue that we are justified in believing in these things (see 5c below).

3. Philosophy of Mathematics

The distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments (see 2b above) is necessary for understanding Kant’s theory of mathematics. Recall that an analytic judgment is one where the truth of the judgment depends only on the relation between the concepts used in the judgment. The truth of a synthetic judgment, by contrast, requires that an object be “given” in sensibility and that the concepts used in the judgment be combined in the object. In these terms, most of Kant’s predecessors took mathematical truths to be analytic truths. Kant, by contrast argued that mathematical knowledge is synthetic. It may seem surprising that one’s knowledge of mathematical truths depends on an object being given in sensibility, for we surely don’t arrive at mathematical knowledge by empirical means. Recall, however, that a judgment can be both synthetic yet a priori. Like the judgments of the necessary structures of experience, mathematics is also synthetic a priori according to Kant.

To make this point, Kant considers the proposition ‘7+5=12’. Surely, this proposition is a priori: I can know its truth without doing empirical experiments to see what happens when I put seven things next to five other things. More to the point, ‘7+5=12’ must be a priori because it is a necessary truth, and empirical judgments are always merely contingent according to Kant. Yet at the same time, the judgment is not analytic because, “The concept of twelve is by no means already thought merely by my thinking of that unification of seven and five, and no matter how long I analyze my concept of such a possible sum I will still not find twelve in it” (B15).

If mathematical knowledge is synthetic, then it depends on objects being given in sensibility. And if it is a priori, then these objects must be non-empirical objects. What sort of objects does Kant have in mind here? The answer lies in Kant’s theory of the pure forms of intuition (space and time). Recall that an intuition is a singular, immediate representation of an individual object (see 2c above). Empirical intuitions represent sensible objects through sensation, but pure intuitions are a priori representations of space and time as such. These pure intuitions of space and time provide the objects of mathematics through what Kant calls a “construction” of concepts in pure intuition. As he puts it, “to construct a concept means to exhibit a priori the intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741). A mathematical concept (for example, ‘triangle’) can be thought of as a rule for how to make an object that corresponds to that concept. Thus if ‘triangle’ is defined as ‘three-sided, two-dimensional shape’, then I construct a triangle in pure intuition when I imagine three lines coming together to form a two-dimensional figure. These pure constructions in intuition can be used to arrive at (synthetic, a priori) mathematical knowledge. Consider the proposition, ‘The angles of a triangle sum to 180 degrees’. When I construct a triangle in intuition in accordance with the rule ‘three-sided, two-dimensional shape’, then the constructed triangle will in fact have angles that sum to 180 degrees. And this will be true irrespective of what particular triangle I constructed (isosceles, scalene, and so forth.). Kant holds that all mathematical knowledge is derived in this fashion: I take a concept, construct it in pure intuition, and then determine what features of the constructed intuition are necessarily true of it.

4. Natural Science

In addition to his work in pure theoretical philosophy, Kant displayed an active interest in the natural sciences throughout his career. Most of his important scientific contributions were in the physical sciences (including not just physics proper, but also earth sciences and cosmology). In Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) he also presented a lengthy discussion of the philosophical basis of the study of biological entities.

In general, Kant thought that a body of knowledge could only count as a science in the true sense if it could admit of mathematical description and an a priori principle that could be “presented a priori in intuition” (4:471). Hence, Kant was pessimistic about the possibility of empirical psychology ever amounting to a true science. Kant even thought it might be the case that “chemistry can be nothing more than a systematic art or experimental doctrine, but never a proper science” (4:471).

This section focuses primarily on Kant’s physics (4a), but it also lists several of Kant’s other scientific contributions (4b).

a. Physics

Kant’s interest in physical theory began early. His first published work, Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces (1749) was an inquiry into some foundational problems in physics, and it entered into the “vis viva” (“living forces”) debate between Leibniz and the Cartesians regarding how to quantify force in moving objects (for the most part, Kant sided with the Leibnizians). A few years later, Kant wrote the Physical Monadology (1756), which dealt with other foundational questions in physics (see 2a above.)

Kant’s mature physical theory is presented in its fullest form in Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786). This theory can be understood as an outgrowth and consequence of the transcendental theory of experience articulated in Critique of Pure Reason (see 2f above). Where the Critique had shown the necessary conceptual forms to which all possible objects of experience must conform, the Metaphysical Foundations specifies in greater detail what exactly the physical constitution of these objects must be like. The continuity with the theory of experience from the Critique is implicit in the very structure of the Metaphysical Foundations. Just as Kant’s theory of experience was divided into four sections corresponding to the four groups of categories (quantity, quality, relation, modality), the body of the Metaphysical Foundations is also divided along the same lines.

Like the theory of the Physical Monadology, the Metaphysical Foundations presents a “dynamical” theory of matter according to which material substance is constituted by an interaction between attractive and repulsive forces. The basic idea is that each volume of material substance possesses a brute tendency to expand and push away other volumes of substance (this is repulsive force) and each volume of substance possesses a brute tendency to contract and to attract other volumes of substance (this is attractive force). The repulsive force explains the solidity and impenetrability of bodies while the attractive force explains gravitation (and presumably also phenomena such as magnetic attraction). Further, any given volume of substance will possess these forces to a determinate degree: the matter in a volume can be more or less repulsive and more or less attractive. The ratio of attractive and repulsive force in a substance will determine how dense the body is. In this respect, Kant’s theory marks a sharp break from those of his mechanist predecessors. (Mechanists believed that all physical phenomena could be explained by appeal to the sizes, shapes, and velocities of material bodies.) The Cartesians thought that there is no true difference in density and that the appearance of differences in density could be explained by appeal to porosity in the body. Similarly, the atomists thought that density could be explained by differences in the ratio of atoms to void in any given volume. Thus for both of these theories, any time there was a volume completely filled in with material substance (no pores, no void), there could only be one possible value for mass divided by volume. According to Kant’s theory, by contrast, two volumes of equal size could be completely filled in with matter and yet differ in their quantity of matter (their mass), and hence differ in their density (mass divided by volume). Another consequence of Kant’s theory that puts him at odds with the Cartesians and atomists was his claim that matter is elastic, hence compressible: a completely filled volume of matter could be reduced in volume while the quantity of matter remained unchanged (hence it would become denser). The Cartesians and atomists took this to be impossible.

At the end of his career, Kant worked on a project that was supposed to complete the connection between the transcendental philosophy and physics. Among other things, Kant attempted to give a transcendental, a priori demonstration of the existence of a ubiquitous “ether” that permeates all of space. Although Kant never completed a manuscript for this project (due primarily to the deterioration of his mental faculties at the end of his life), he did leave behind many notes and partial drafts. Many of these notes and drafts have been edited and published under the title Opus Postumum. 

b. Other Scientific Contributions

In addition to his major contributions to physics, Kant published various writings addressing different issues in the natural sciences. Early on he showed a great deal of interest in geology and earth science, as evidenced by the titles of some of his shorter essays: The question, Whether the Earth is Ageing, Considered from a Physical Point of View (1754); On the Causes of Earthquakes on the Occasion of the Calamity that Befell the Western Countries of Europe Towards the End of Last Year (1756); Continued Observations on the Earthquakes that Have been Experienced for Some Time (1756); New Notes to Explain the Theory of the Winds, in which, at the Same Time, He Invites Attendance to his Lectures (1756).

In 1755, he wrote the Succinct Exposition of Some Meditations on Fire (which he submitted to the university as a Master’s Thesis). There he argued, against the Cartesian mechanists, that physical phenomena such as fire can only be explained by appeal to elastic (that is, compressible) matter, which anticipated the mature physics of his Metaphysical Foundations (see 4a above).

One of Kant’s most lasting scientific contributions came from his early work in cosmology. In his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), Kant gave a mechanical explanation of the formation of the solar system and the galaxies in terms of the principles of Newtonian physics. (A shorter version of the argument also appears in The Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God from 1763.) Kant’s hypothesis was that a single mechanical process could explain why we observe an orbital motion of smaller bodies around larger ones at many different scales in the cosmos (moons around planets, planets around stars, and stars around the center of the galaxy). He proposed that at the beginning of creation, all matter was spread out more or less evenly and randomly in a kind of nebula. Since the various bits of matter all attracted each other through gravitation, bodies would move towards each other within local regions to form larger bodies. The largest of these became stars, and the smaller ones became moons or planets. Because everything was already in motion (due to the gravitational attraction of everything to everything), and because all objects would be pulled towards the center of mass of their local region (for example, the sun at the center of the solar system, or a planet at the center of its own smaller planetary system), the motion of objects within that region would become orbital motions (as described by Newton’s theory of gravity). Although the Universal Natural History was not widely read for most of Kant’s lifetime (due primarily to Kant’s publisher going bankrupt while the printed books remained in a warehouse), in 1796 Pierre-Simon Laplace (1749-1827) proposed a remarkably similar version of the same theory, and this caused renewed interest in Kant’s book. Today the theory is referred to as the “Kant-Laplace Nebular Hypothesis,” and a modified version of this theory is still held today.

Finally, in the second half of Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), Kant discusses the philosophical foundations of biology by way of an analysis of teleological judgments. While in no way a fully worked out biological theory per se, Kant connects his account of biological cognition in interesting ways to other important aspects of his philosophical system. First, natural organisms are essentially teleological, or “purposive.” This purposiveness is manifested through the organic structure of the organism: its many parts all work together to constitute the whole, and any one part only makes sense in terms of its relation to the healthy functioning of the whole. For instance, the teeth of an animal are designed to chew the kind of food that the animal is equipped to hunt or forage and that it is suited to digest. In this respect, biological entities bear a strong analogy to great works of art. Great works of art are also organic insofar as the parts only make sense in the context of the whole, and art displays a purposiveness similar to that found in nature (see section 7 below). Second, Kant discusses the importance of biology with respect to theological cognition. While he denies that the apparent design behind the purposiveness of organisms can be used as a proof for God’s existence (see 2g3 above), he does think that the purposiveness found in nature provides a sort of hint that there is an intelligible principle behind the observable, natural world, and hence that the ultimate purpose of all of nature is a rational one. In connection with his moral theory and theory of human history (see sections 5 and 6 below), Kant will argue that the teleology of nature can be understood as ultimately directed towards a culmination in a fully rational nature, that is, humanity in its (future) final form.

5. Moral Theory

Kant’s moral theory is organized around the idea that to act morally and to act in accordance with reason are one and the same. In virtue of being a rational agent (that is, in virtue of possessing practical reason, reason which is interested and goal-directed), one is obligated to follow the moral law that practical reason prescribes. To do otherwise is to act irrationally. Because Kant places his emphasis on the duty that comes with being a rational agent who is cognizant of the moral law, Kant’s theory is considered a form of deontology (deon- comes from the Greek for “duty” or “obligation”).

Like his theoretical philosophy, Kant’s practical philosophy is a priori, formal, and universal: the moral law is derived non-empirically from the very structure of practical reason itself (its form), and since all rational agents share the same practical reason, the moral law binds and obligates everyone equally. So what is this moral law that obligates all rational agents universally and a priori? The moral law is determined by what Kant refers to as the Categorical Imperative, which is the general principle that demands that one respect the humanity in oneself and in others, that one not make an exception for oneself when deliberating about how to act, and in general that one only act in accordance with rules that everyone could and should obey.

Although Kant insists that the moral law is equally binding for all rational agents, he also insists that the bindingness of the moral law is self-imposed: we autonomously prescribe the moral law to ourselves. Because Kant thinks that the kind of autonomy in question here is only possible under the presupposition of a transcendentally free basis of moral choice, the constraint that the moral law places on an agent is not only consistent with freedom of the will, it requires it. Hence, one of the most important aspects of Kant’s project is to show that we are justified in presupposing that our morally significant choices are grounded in a transcendental freedom (the very sort of freedom that Kant argued we could not prove through mere “theoretical” or “speculative” reason; see 2gii above).

This section aims to explain the structure and content of Kant’s moral theory (5a-b), and also Kant’s claims that belief in freedom, God, and the immortality of the soul are necessary “postulates” of practical reason (5c). (On the relation between Kant’s moral theory and his aesthetic theory, see 7c below.)

a. The Good Will and Duty

Kant lays out the case for his moral theory in Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), Critique of Practical Reason (also known as the “Second Critique”; 1788), and the Metaphysics of Morals (1797). His arguments from the Groundwork are his most well-known and influential, so the following focuses primarily on them.

Kant begins his argument from the premise that a moral theory must be grounded in an account of what is unconditionally good. If something is merely conditionally good, that is, if its goodness depends on something else, then that other thing will either be merely conditionally good as well, in which case its goodness depends on yet another thing, or it will be unconditionally good. All goodness, then, must ultimately be traceable to something that is unconditionally good. There are many things that we typically think of as good but that are not truly unconditionally good. Beneficial resources such as money or power are often good, but since these things can be used for evil purposes, their goodness is conditional on the use to which they are put. Strength of character is generally a good thing, but again, if someone uses a strong character to successfully carry out evil plans, then the strong character is not good. Even happiness, according to Kant, is not unconditionally good. Although all humans universally desire to be happy, if someone is happy but does not deserve their happiness (because, for instance, their happiness results from stealing from the elderly), then it is not good for the person to be happy. Happiness is only good on the condition that the happiness is deserved.

Kant argues that there is only one thing that can be considered unconditionally good: a good will. A person has a good will insofar as they form their intentions on the basis of a self-conscious respect for the moral law, that is, for the rules regarding what a rational agent ought to do, one’s duty. The value of a good will lies in the principles on the basis of which it forms its intentions; it does not lie in the consequences of the actions that the intentions lead to. This is true even if a good will never leads to any desirable consequences at all: “Even if… this will should wholly lack the capacity to carry out its purpose… then, like a jewel, it would still shine by itself, as something that has its full worth in itself” (4:393). This is in line with Kant’s emphasis on the unconditional goodness of a good will: if a will were evaluated in terms of its consequences, then the goodness of the will would depend on (that is, would be conditioned on) those consequences. (In this respect, Kant’s deontology is in stark opposition to consequentialist moral theories, which base their moral evaluations on the consequences of actions rather than the intentions behind them.)

b. The Categorical Imperative

If a good will is one that forms its intentions on the basis of correct principles of action, then we want to know what sort of principles these are. A principle that commands an action is called an “imperative.” Most imperatives are “hypothetical imperatives,” that is, they are commands that hold only if certain conditions are met. For instance: “if you want to be a successful shopkeeper, then cultivate a reputation for honesty.” Since hypothetical imperatives are conditioned on desires and the intended consequences of actions, they cannot serve as the principles that determine the intentions and volitions of an unconditionally good will. Instead, we require what Kant calls a “categorical imperative.” Where hypothetical imperatives take the form, “if y is desired/intended/sought, do x,” categorical imperatives simply take the form, “do x.” Since a categorical imperative is stripped of all reference to the consequences of an action, it is thereby stripped of all determinate content, and hence it is purely formal. And since it is unconditional, it holds universally. Hence a categorical imperative expresses only the very form of a universally binding law: “nothing is left but the conformity of actions as such with universal law” (4:402). To act morally, then, is to form one’s intentions on the basis of the very idea of a universal principle of action.

This conception of a categorical imperative leads Kant to his first official formulation of the categorical imperative itself: “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). A maxim is a general rule that can be used to determine particular courses of actions in particular circumstances. For instance, the maxim “I shall lie when it will get me out of trouble” can be used to determine the decision to lie about an adulterous liaison. The categorical imperative offers a decision procedure for determining whether a given course of action is in accordance with the moral law. After determining what maxim one would be basing the action in question on, one then asks whether it would be possible, given the power (in an imagined, hypothetical scenario), to choose that everyone act in accordance with that same maxim. If it is possible to will that everyone act according to that maxim, then the action under consideration is morally permissible. If it is not possible to will that everyone act according to that maxim, the action is morally impermissible. Lying to cover up adultery is thus immoral because one cannot will that everyone act according to the maxim, “I shall lie when it will get me out of trouble.” Note that it is not simply that it would be undesirable for everyone to act according to that maxim. Rather, it would be impossible. Since everyone would know that everyone else was acting according to that maxim, there would never be the presupposition that anyone was telling the truth; the very act of lying, of course, requires such a presupposition on the part of the one being lied to. Hence, the state of affairs where everyone lies to get out of trouble can never arise, so it cannot be willed to be a universal law. It fails the test of the categorical imperative.

The point of Kant’s appeal to the universal law formulation of the categorical imperative is to show that an action is morally permissible only if the maxim on which the action is based could be affirmed as a universal law that everyone obeys without exception. The mark of immorality, then, is that one makes an exception for oneself. That is, one acts in a way that they would not want everyone else to. When someone chooses to lie about an adulterous liaison, one is implicitly thinking, “in general people should tell the truth, but in this case I will be the exception to the rule.”

Kant’s first formulation of the categorical imperative describes it in terms of the very form of universal law itself. This formal account abstracts from any specific content that the moral law might have for living, breathing human beings. Kant offers a second formulation to address the material side of the moral law. Since the moral law has to do with actions, and all actions are by definition teleological (that is, goal-directed), a material formulation of the categorical imperative will require an appeal to the “ends” of human activity. Some ends are merely instrumental, that is, they are sought only because they serve as “means” towards further ends. Kant argues that the moral law must be aimed at an end that is not merely instrumental, but is rather an end in itself. Only rational agents, according to Kant, are ends in themselves. To act morally is thus to respect rational agents as ends in themselves. Accordingly, the categorical imperative can be reformulated as follows: “So act that you use humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means” (4:429). The basic idea here is that it is immoral to treat someone as a thing of merely instrumental value; persons have an intrinsic (non-instrumental) value, and the moral law demands that we respect this intrinsic value. To return to the example of the previous paragraphs, it would be wrong to lie about an adulterous liaison because by withholding the truth one is manipulating the other person to make things easier for oneself; this sort of manipulation, however, amounts to treating the other as a thing (as a mere means to the comfort of not getting in trouble), and not as a person deserving of respect and entitled to the truth.

The notion of a universal law provides the form of the categorical imperative and rational agents as ends in themselves provide the matter. These two sides of the categorical imperative are combined into yet a third formulation, which appeals to the notion of a “kingdom of ends.” A kingdom of ends can be thought of as a sort of perfectly just utopian ideal in which all citizens of this kingdom freely respect the intrinsic worth of the humanity in all others because of an autonomously self-imposed recognition of the bindingness of the universal moral law for all rational agents. The third formulation of the categorical imperative is simply the idea that one should act in whatever way a member of this perfectly just society would act: “act in accordance with the maxims of a member giving universal laws for a merely possible kingdom of ends” (4:439). The idea of a kingdom of ends is an ideal (hence the “merely possible”). Although humanity may never be able to achieve such a perfect state of utopian coexistence, we can at least strive to approximate this state to an ever greater degree.

c. Postulates of Practical Reason

In Critique of Pure Reason, Kant had argued that although we can acknowledge the bare logical possibility that humans possess free will, that there is an immortal soul, and that there is a God, he also argued that we can never have positive knowledge of these things (see 2g above). In his ethical writings, however, Kant complicates this story. He argues that despite the theoretical impossibility of knowledge of these objects, belief in them is nevertheless a precondition for moral action (and for practical cognition generally). Accordingly, freedom, immortality, and God are “postulates of practical reason.” (The following discussion draws primarily on Critique of Practical Reason.)

We will start with freedom. Kant argues that morality and the obligation that comes with it are only possible if humans have free will. This is because the universal laws prescribed by the categorical imperative presuppose autonomy (autos = self; nomos = law). To be autonomous is to be the free ground of one’s own principles, or “laws” of action. Kant argues that if we presuppose that humans are rational and have free will, then his entire moral theory follows directly. The problem, however, lies in justifying the belief that we are free. Kant had argued in the Second Analogy of Experience that every event in the natural world has a “determining ground,” that is, a cause, and so all human actions, as natural events, themselves have deterministic causes (see 2f above). The only room for freedom of the will would lie in the realm of things in themselves, which contains the noumenal correlate of my phenomenal self. Since things in themselves are unknowable, I can never look to them to get evidence that I possess transcendental freedom. Kant gives at least two arguments to justify belief in freedom as a precondition of his moral theory. (There is a great deal of controversy among commentators regarding the exact form of his arguments, as well as their success. It will not be possible to adjudicate those disputes in any detail here. See Section 10 (References and Further Readings) for references to some of these commentaries.)

In the Groundwork, Kant suggests that the presupposition that we are free follows as a consequence of the fact that we have practical reason and that we think of ourselves as practical agents. Any time I face a choice that requires deliberation, I must consider the options before me as really open. If I thought of my course of action as already determined ahead of time, then there would not really be any choice to make. Furthermore, in taking my deliberation to be real, I also think of the possible outcomes of my actions as caused by me. The notion of a causality that originates in the self is the notion of a free will. So the very fact that I do deliberate about what actions I will take means that I am presupposing that my choice is real and hence that I am free. As Kant puts it, all practical agents act “under the idea of freedom” (4:448). It is not obvious that this argument is strong enough for Kant’s purposes. The position seems to be that I must act as though I am free, but acting as though I am free in no way entails that I really am free. At best, it seems that since I act as though I am free, I thereby must act as though morality really does obligate me. This does not establish that the moral law really does obligate me.

In the Second Critique, Kant offers a different argument for the reality of freedom. He argues that it is a brute “fact of reason” (5:31) that the categorical imperative (and so morality generally) obligates us as rational agents. In other words, all rational agents are at least implicitly conscious of the bindingness of the moral law on us. Since morality requires freedom, it follows that if morality is real, then freedom must be real too. Thus this “fact of reason” allows for an inference to the reality of freedom. Although the conclusion of this argument is stronger than the earlier argument, its premise is more controversial. For instance, it is far from obvious that all rational agents are conscious of the moral law. If they were, how come no one discovered this exact moral law before 1785 when Kant wrote the Groundwork? Equally problematic, it is not clear why this “fact of reason” should count as knowledge of the bindingness of the moral law. It may just be that we cannot help but believe that the moral law obligates us, in which case we once again end up merely acting as though we are free and as though the moral law is real.

Again, there is much debate in the literature about the structure and success of Kant’s arguments. It is clear, however, that the success of Kant’s moral project stands or falls with his arguments for freedom of the will, and that the overall strength of this theory is determined to a high degree by the epistemic status of our belief in our own freedom.

Kant’s arguments for immortality and God as postulates of practical reason presuppose that the reality of the moral law and the freedom of the will have been established, and they also depend on the principle that “‘ought’ implies ‘can’”: one cannot be obligated to do something unless the thing in question is doable. For instance, there is no sense in which I am obligated to single-handedly solve global poverty, because it is not within my power to do so. According to Kant, the ultimate aim of a rational moral agent should be to become perfectly moral. We are obligated to strive to become ever more moral. Given the “ought implies can” principle, if we ought to work towards moral perfection, then moral perfection must be possible and we can become perfect. However, Kant holds that moral perfection is something that finite rational agents such as humans can only progress towards, but not actually attain in any finite amount of time, and certainly not within any one human lifetime. Thus the moral law demands an “endless progress” towards “complete conformity of the will with the moral law” (5:122). This endless progress towards perfection can only be demanded of us if our own existence is endless. In short, one’s belief that one should strive towards moral perfection presupposes the belief in the immortality of the soul.

In addition to the “ought implies can” principle, Kant’s argument about belief in God also involves an elaboration of the notion of the “highest good” at which all moral action aims (at least indirectly). According to Kant, the highest good, that is, the most perfect possible state for a community of rational agents, is not only one in which all agents act in complete conformity with the moral law. It is also a state in which these agents are happy. Kant had argued that although everyone naturally desires to be happy, happiness is only good when one deserves to be happy. In the ideal scenario of a morally perfect community of rational agents, everyone deserves to be happy. Since a deserved happiness is a good thing, the highest good will involve a situation in which everyone acts in complete conformity with the moral law and everyone is completely happy because they deserve to be. Now since we are obligated to work towards this highest good, this complete, universal, morally justified happiness must be possible (again, because “ought” implies “can”). This is where a puzzle arises. Although happiness is connected to morality at the conceptual level when one deserves happiness, there is no natural connection between morality and happiness. Our happiness depends on the natural world (for example, whether we are healthy, whether natural disasters affect us), and the natural world operates according to laws that are completely separate from the laws of morality. Accordingly, acting morally is in general no guarantee that nature will make it possible for one to be happy. If anything, behaving morally will often decrease one’s happiness (for doing the right thing often involves doing the uncomfortable, difficult thing). And we all have plenty of empirical evidence from the world we live in that often bad things happen to good people and good things happen to bad people. Thus if the highest good (in which happiness is proportioned to virtue) is possible, then somehow there must be a way for the laws of nature to eventually lead to a situation in which happiness is proportioned to virtue. (Note that since at this point in the argument, Kant takes himself to have established immortality as a postulate of practical reason, this “eventually” may very well be far in the future). Since the laws of nature and the laws of morality are completely separate on their own, the only way that the two could come together such that happiness ends up proportioned to virtue would be if the ultimate cause and ground of nature set up the world in such a way that the laws of nature would eventually lead to the perfect state in question. Therefore, the possibility of the highest good requires the presupposition that the cause of the world is intelligent and powerful enough to set nature up in the right way, and also that it wills in accordance with justice that eventually the laws of nature will indeed lead to a state in which the happiness of rational agents is proportioned to their virtue. This intelligent, powerful, and just cause of the world is what traditionally goes by the name of “God.” Hence God is a postulate of practical reason.

6. Political Theory and Theory of Human History

Kant’s ethical theory emphasized reason, autonomy, and a respect for the humanity of others. These central aspects of his theory of individual moral choice are carried over to his theories of humanity’s history and of ideal political organization. This section covers Kant’s teleological history of the human race (6a), the basic elements of his political theory (6b), and his theory of the possibility of world peace (6c).

a. Human History and the Age of Enlightenment

Kant’s socio-political philosophy must be understood in terms of his understanding of the history of humanity, of its teleology, and in terms of his particular time and place: Europe during the Enlightenment.

In his short essay “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose” (1784), Kant outlines a speculative sketch of humanity’s history organized around his conception of the teleology intrinsic to the species. The natural purpose of humanity is the development of reason. This development is not something that can take place in one individual lifetime, but is instead the ongoing project of humanity across the generations. Nature fosters this goal through both human physiology and human psychology. Humans have no fur, claws, or sharp teeth, and so if we are to be sheltered and fed, we must use our reason to create the tools necessary to satisfy our needs. More importantly, at the cultural level, Kant argues that human society is characterized by an “unsocial sociability”: on the one hand, humans need to live with other humans and we feel incomplete in isolation; but on the other, we frequently disagree with each other and are frustrated when others don’t agree with us on important matters. The frustration brought on by disagreement serves as an incentive to develop our capacity to reason so that we can argue persuasively and convince others to agree with us.

By means of our physiological deficiencies and our unsocial sociability, nature has nudged us, generation by generation, to develop our capacity for reason and slowly to emerge from the hazy fog of pre-history up to the present. This development is not yet complete. Kant takes stock of where we were in his day, in late 18th c. Prussia) in his short, popular essay: “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” (1784). To be enlightened, he argues, is to determine one’s beliefs and actions in accordance with the free use of one’s reason. The process of enlightenment is humanity’s “emergence from its self-incurred immaturity” (8:35), that is, the emergence from an uncritical reliance on the authority of others (for example, parents, monarchs, or priests). This is a slow, on-going process. Kant thought that his own age was an age of enlightenment, but not yet a fully enlightened age.

The goal of humanity is to reach a point where all interpersonal interactions are conducted in accordance with reason, and hence in accordance with the moral law (this is the idea of a kingdom of ends described in 5b above). Kant thinks that there are two significant conditions that must be in place before such an enlightened age can come to be. First, humans must live in a perfectly just society under a perfectly just constitution. Second, the nations of the world must coexist as an international federation in a state of “perpetual peace.” Some aspects of the first condition are discussed in 6b, and of the second in 6c.

b. Political Theory

Kant fullest articulation of his political theory appears in the “Doctrine of Right,” which is the first half of Metaphysics of Morals (1797). In line with his belief that a freedom grounded in rationality is what bestows dignity upon human beings, Kant organizes his theory of justice around the notion of freedom: “Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law, or if on its maxim the freedom of choice of each can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law” (6:230). Implicit in this definition is a theory of equality: everyone should be granted the same degree of freedom. Although a state, through the passing and enforcing of laws, necessarily restricts freedom to some degree, Kant argues that this is necessary for the preservation of equality of human freedom. This is because when the freedoms of all are unchecked (for example, in the state of nature, which is also a condition of anarchy), the strong will overpower the weak and infringe on their freedoms, in which case freedoms will not be distributed equally, contrary to Kant’s basic principle of right. Hence a fair and lawful coercion that restricts freedom is consistent with and required by maximal and equal degrees of freedom for all.

Kant holds that republicanism is the ideal form of government. In a republic, voters elect representatives and these representatives decide on particular laws on behalf of the people. (Kant shows that he was not free of the prejudices of his day, and claims, with little argument, that neither women nor the poor should be full citizens with voting rights.) Representatives are duty-bound to choose these laws from the perspective of the “general will” (a term Kant borrows from Rousseau), rather than from the perspective of the interests of any one individual or group within society. Even though the entire population does not vote on each individual law, a law is said to be just only in case an entire population of rational agents could and would consent to the law. In this respect, Kant’s theory of just law is analogous to his universal law formulation of the categorical imperative: both demand that it be possible in principle for everyone to affirm the rule in question (see 5b above).

Among the freedoms that ought to be respected in a just society (republican or otherwise) are the freedom to pursue happiness in any way one chooses (so long as this pursuit does not infringe the rights of others, of course), freedom of religion, and freedom of speech. These last two are especially important to Kant and he associated them with the ongoing enlightenment of humanity in “What is Enlightenment?” He argues that it “would be a crime against human nature” (8:39) to legislate religious doctrine because doing so would be to deny to humans the very free use of reason that makes them human. Similarly, restrictions on what Kant calls the “public use of one’s reason” are contrary to the most basic teleology of the human species, namely, the development of reason. Kant himself had felt the sting of an infringement on these rights when the government of Friedrich Wilhelm II (the successor to Frederick the Great) prohibited Kant from publishing anything further on matters pertaining to religion.

c. Perpetual Peace

Kant elaborates the cosmopolitan theory first proposed in “Idea for a Universal History” in his Towards Perpetual Peace (1795). The basic idea is that world peace can be achieved only when international relations mirror, in certain respects, the relations between individuals in a just society. Just as people cannot be traded as things, so too states cannot be traded as though they were mere property. Just as individuals must respect others’ rights to free self-determination, so too, “no state shall forcibly interfere in the constitution and government of another state” (8:346). And in general, just as individuals need to arrange themselves into just societies, states, considered as individuals themselves, must arrange themselves into a global federation, a “league of nations” (8:354). Of course, until a state of perpetual peace is reached, wars will be inevitable. Even in times of wars, however, certain laws must be respected. For instance, it is never permissible for hostilities to become so violent as to undermine the possibility of a future peace treaty.

Kant argued that republicanism is especially conducive to peace, and he argued that perpetual peace would require that all states be republics. This is because the people will only consent to a war if they are willing to bear the economic burdens that war brings, and such a cost will only be worthwhile when there is a truly dire threat. If only the will of the monarch is required to go to war, since the monarch will not have to bear the full burden of the war (the cost will be distributed among the subjects), there is much less disincentive against war.

According to Kant, war is the result of an imbalance or disequilibrium in international relations. Although wars are never desirable, they lead to new conditions in international relations, and sometimes these new conditions are more balanced than the previous ones. When they are more balanced, there is less chance of new war occurring. Overall then, although the progression is messy and violent along the way, the slow march towards perpetual peace is a process in which all the states of the world slowly work towards a condition of balance and equilibrium.

7. Theory of Art and Beauty

Kant’s most worked out presentation of his views on aesthetics appears in Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), also known as the “Third Critique.” As the title implies, Kant’s aesthetic theory is cashed out through an analysis of the operations of the faculty of judgment. That is, Kant explains what it is for something to be beautiful by explaining what goes into the judgment that something is beautiful. This section explains the structure of aesthetic judgments of the beautiful and the sublime (7a), summarizes Kant’s theory of art and the genius behind art (7b), and finally explains the connection between Kant’s aesthetic theory and his moral theory (7c).

a. The Beautiful and the Sublime

Kant holds that there are three different types of aesthetic judgments: judgments of the agreeable, of the beautiful, and of the sublime. The first is not particularly interesting, because it pertains simply to whatever objects happen to cause us (personally) pleasure or pain. There is nothing universal about such judgments. If one person finds botanical gin pleasant and another does not, there is no disagreement, simply different responses to the stimulus. Judgments of the beautiful and the sublime, however, are more interesting and worth spending some time on.

Let us consider judgments of beauty (which Kant calls “judgments of taste”) first. Kant argues that all judgments of taste involve four components, or “moments.” First, judgments of taste involve a subjective yet disinterested enjoyment. We have an appreciation for the object without desiring it. This contrasts judgments of taste from both cognitions, which represent objects as they are rather than how they affect us, and desires, which represent objects in terms of what we want. Second, judgments of taste involve universality. When we judge an object to be beautiful, implicit in the judgment is the belief that everyone should judge the object in the same way. Third, judgments of taste involve the form of purposiveness, or “purposeless purposiveness.” Beautiful objects seem to be “for” something, even though there is nothing determinate that they are for. Fourth, judgments of taste involve necessity. When presented with a beautiful object, I take it that I ought to judge it as beautiful. Taken together, the theory is this: when I judge something as beautiful, I enjoy the object without having any desires with respect to it, I believe that everyone should judge the object to be beautiful, I represent some kind of purposiveness in it, but without applying any concepts that would determine its specific purpose, and I also represent myself as being obligated to judge it to be beautiful. Judgments of beauty are thus quite peculiar. On the one hand, when we say an object is beautiful, it is not the same sort of predication as when I say something is green, is a horse, or fits in a breadbox. Yet it is not for that reason a purely subjective, personal judgment because of the necessity and intersubjective universality involved in such judgments.

A further remark is in order regarding the “form of purposiveness” in judgments of taste. Kant wants to emphasize that no determinate concepts are involved in judgments of taste, but that the “reflective” power of judgment (that is, judgment’s ability to seek to find a suitable concept to fit an object) is nevertheless very active during such judgments. When I encounter an unfamiliar object, my reflective judgment is set in motion and seeks a concept until I figure out what sort of thing the object is. When I encounter a beautiful object, the form of purposiveness in the object also sets my reflecting judgment in motion, but no determinate concept is ever found for the object. Although this might be expected to lead to frustration, Kant instead claims that it provokes a “free play” (5:217) between the imagination and understanding. Kant does not say as much about this “free play” as one would like, but the idea seems to be that since the experience is not constrained by a determinate concept that must be applied to the object, the imagination and understanding are free to give in to a lively interplay of thought and emotion in response to the object. The experience of this free play of the faculties is the part of the aesthetic experience that we take to be enjoyable.

Aside from judgments of taste, there is another important form of aesthetic experience: the experience of the sublime. According to Kant, the experience of the sublime occurs when we face things (whether natural or manmade) that dwarf the imagination and make us feel tiny and insignificant in comparison. When we face something so large that we cannot come up with a concept to adequately capture its magnitude, we experience a feeling akin to vertigo. A good example of this is the “Deep Field” photographs from the Hubble Telescope. We already have trouble comprehending the enormity of the Milky Way, but when we see an image containing thousands of other galaxies of approximately the same size, the mind cannot even hope to comprehend the immensity of what is depicted. Although this sort of experience can be disconcerting, Kant also says that a disinterested pleasure (similar to the pleasure in the beautiful) is experienced when the ideas of reason pertaining to the totality of the cosmos are brought into play. Although the understanding can have no empirical concept of such an indeterminable magnitude, reason has such an idea (in Kant’s technical sense of “idea”; see 2g above), namely, the idea of the world as an indefinitely large totality. This feeling that reason can subsume and capture even the totality of the immeasurable cosmos leads to the peculiar pleasure of the sublime.

b. Theory of Art

Both natural objects and manmade art can be judged to be beautiful. Kant suggests that natural beauties are purest, but works of art are especially interesting because they result from human genius. The following briefly summarizes Kant’s theory of art and genius.

Although art must be manmade and not natural, Kant holds that art is beautiful insofar as it imitates the beauty of nature. Specifically, a beautiful work of art must display the “form of purposiveness” (described above, 7a) that can be encountered in the natural world. What makes great art truly great, though, is that it is the result of genius in the artist. According to Kant, genius is the innate talent possessed by the exceptional, gifted individual that allows that individual to translate an intangible “aesthetic idea” into a tangible work of art. Aesthetic ideas are the counterparts to the ideas of reason (see 2g above): where ideas of reason are concepts for which no sensible intuition is adequate, aesthetic ideas are representations of the imagination for which no concept is adequate (this is in line with Kant’s claim that beauty is not determinately conceptualizable).  When a genius is successful at exhibiting an aesthetic idea in a beautiful work of art, the work will provoke the “free play” of the faculties described above (7a).

Kant divides the arts into three groups: the arts of speech (rhetoric and poetry), pictorial arts (sculpture, architecture, and painting), and the art of the play of sensations (music and “the art of colors”) (5:321ff.). These can, of course, be combined together. For instance opera combines music and poetry into song, and combines this with theatre (which Kant considers a form of painting). Kant deems poetry the greatest of the arts because of its ability to stimulate the imagination and understanding and expand the mind through reflection. Music is the most successful if judged in terms of “charm and movement of the mind” (5:328), because it evokes the affect and feeling of human speech, but without being constrained by the determinate concepts of actual words. However, if the question is which art advances culture the most, Kant thinks that painting is better than music.

One consequence of Kant’s theory of art is that the contemporary notion of “conceptual art” is a contradiction in terms: if there is a specific point or message (a determinate concept) that the artist is trying to get across, then the work cannot provoke the indeterminate free play that is necessary for the experience of the beautiful. At best, such works can be interesting or provocative, but not truly beautiful and hence not truly art.

c. Relation to Moral Theory

A final important aspect of Kant’s aesthetic theory is his claim that beauty is a “symbol” of morality (5:351ff.), and aesthetic judgment thereby functions as a sort of “propaedeutic” for moral cognition. This is because certain aspects of judgments of taste (see 7a above) are analogous in important respects to moral judgments. The immediacy and disinterestedness of aesthetic appreciation corresponds to the demand that moral virtue be praised even when it does not lead to tangibly beneficial consequences: it is good in itself. The free play of the faculties involved in appreciation of the beautiful reminds one of the freedom necessary for and presupposed by morality. And the universality and necessity involved in aesthetic judgments correspond to the universality and necessity of the moral law. In short, Kant holds that a cultivated sensitivity to aesthetic pleasures helps prepare the mind for moral cognition. Aesthetic appreciation makes one sensitive to the fact that there are pleasures beyond the merely agreeable just as there are goods beyond the merely instrumental.

8. Pragmatic Anthropology

Together with a course on “physical geography” (a study of the world), Kant taught a class on “pragmatic anthropology” almost every year of his career as a university teacher. Towards the end of his career, Kant allowed his collected lecture notes for his anthropology course to be edited and published as Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1789). Anthropology, for Kant, is simply the study of human nature. Pragmatic anthropology is useful, practical knowledge that students would need in order to successfully navigate the world and get through life.

The Anthropology is interesting in two very different ways. First, Kant presents detailed discussions of his views on issues related to empirical psychology, moral psychology, and aesthetic taste that fill out and give substance to the highly abstract presentations of his writings in pure theoretical philosophy. For instance, although in the theory of experience from Critique of Pure Reason Kant argues that we need sensory intuitions in order to have empirical cognition of the world, he does not explain in any detail how our specific senses—sight, hearing, touch, taste, smell—contribute to this cognition. The Anthropology fills in a lot of this story. For instance, we learn that sight and hearing are necessary for us to represent objects as public and intersubjectively available. And we learn that touch is necessary for us to represent objects as solid, and hence as substantial. With respect to his moral theory, many of Kant’s ethical writings can give the impression that emotions and sentiments can only work against morality, and that only pure reason can incline one towards the good. In the Anthropology Kant complicates this story, informing us that nature has implanted sentiments of compassion to incline us towards the good, even in the absence of a developed reason. Once reason has been developed, it can promote an “enthusiasm of good resolution” (7:254) through attention to concrete instances of virtuous action, in which case desire can work in cooperation with reason’s moral law, not against it. Kant also supplements his moral theory through pedagogical advice about how to cultivate an inclination towards moral behavior.

The other aspect of the Anthropology (and the student transcripts of his actual lectures) that makes it so interesting is that the wealth and range of examples and discussions gives a much fuller picture of Kant the person than we can get from his more technical writings. The many examples present a picture of a man with wide-ranging opinions on all aspects of the human experience. There are discussions of dreams, humor, boredom, personality-types, facial expressions, pride and greed, gender and race issues, and more. We even get some fashion advice: it is acceptable to wear yellow under a blue coat, but gaudy to wear blue under a yellow coat. There has been a great deal of renewed interest in Kant’s anthropological writings and many commentators have been appealing to these often neglected texts as a helpful resource that provides contextualization of Kant’s more widely studied theoretical output.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Literature

The best scholarly, English translations of Kant’s work are published by Cambridge University Press as the Cambridge Editions of the Works of Immanuel Kant. The following are from that collection and contain some of Kant’s most important and influential writings.

  • Critique of Pure Reason, trans. Paul Guyer and Allen Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Practical Philosophy, ed. Mary Gregor. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. (Contains most of Kant’s ethical writings, including Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, Critique of Practical Reason, and Metaphysics of Morals.)
  • Critique of the Power of Judgment, trans. Paul Guyer and Eric MatthewsCambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770, ed. David Walford. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. (Contains most of Kant’s “pre-critical” writings in theoretical philosophy.)
  • Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, eds. Henry Allison and Peter Heath. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002 (Contains Kant’s mature writings in theoretical philosophy, including Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics and Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science.)
  • History, Anthropology, and Education, eds. Günter Zöller and Robert Louden. . Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. (Contains, among other writings, Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View.)

b. Secondary Literature

  • Ernst Cassirer (Kant’s Life and Thought, tr. by James Haden. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1983 (originally written in 1916)) and Manfred Kuehn (Kant: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002) both offer intellectual biographies that situate the development of Kant’s thought within the context of his life and times.
  • For comprehensive discussions of the metaphysics and epistemology of Critique of Pure Reason, see Paul Guyer (Kant and the Claims of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987), Henry Allison (Kant’s Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, Second Edition. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004), and Graham Bird (The Revolutionary Kant: A Commentary on the Critique of Pure Reason. Chicago: Open Court Press, 2006).
  • For treatments of Kant’s ethical theory, see Allen Wood (Kant’s Ethical Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), Christine Korsgaard (Creating the Kingdom of Ends. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), and Onora O’Neill (Constructions of Reason: Explorations of Kant’s Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
  • For analyses of Kant’s aesthetic theory (as well as other issues from the Third Critique), see Rachel Zuckert (Kant on Beauty and Biology: An Interpretation of the ‘Critique of Judgment’. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010), Paul Guyer (Kant and the Claims of Taste. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), and Henry Allison (Kant’s Theory of Taste: A Reading of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).
  • For studies of Kant’s anthropology and theory of human nature, see Patrick Frierson (What is the Human Being? London: Routledge, 2013) and Alix Cohen (Kant and the Human Sciences: Biology, Anthropology and History. London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2009).


Author Information

Tim Jankowiak
Towson University
U. S. A.

Roy Wood Sellars (1880—1973)

from The Papers of Roy Wood Sellars; used by permission of the Bentley Historical Library at the University of MichiganRoy Wood Sellars was one of a generation of systematic philosophers in America the likes of which has not been seen before or since. He was born in Seaforth, Ontario in Canada, and spent most of his career at the University of Michigan where he continued working well into his 90s.  He was a fiercely independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to follow his own instincts.  He believed that the philosopher should be well-grounded both in the history of philosophy and in the sciences, and that the philosopher should engage philosophically with the major moral, social, and political issues of the day. His central aims were to combine and harmonize the insights of science and common sense, to update religion with the scientific advances of the day, and to promote a science-grounded system of progressive humanistic values. Over the course of his long life, Sellars wrote and published prolifically. He is the author of 15 books, over 100 articles, 14 book reviews and several miscellaneous works. He is best known for his pioneering formulations of critical realism (roughly, the view that, first, human beings normally perceive independent objects with their sensations but do not perceive sensations, and, second, human beings must interpret their sensations), evolutionary naturalism (a naturalistic version of emergent evolution), the “double knowledge” and mind-brain identity theory (the view that human beings possess two modes of knowledge of a single material reality), and a defence of religious humanism (the view that religion must be reinterpreted in terms of its role in improving humanity’s “this-worldly” existence).  He is the primary author of the Humanist Manifesto I of 1933.  Finally, he is the father of Wilfrid Sellars, a highly influential philosopher in his own right, many of whose views, allowing for the different vernacular and emphasis of the two periods, are continuous with his father’s views.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critical Realism
  3. Evolutionary Naturalism
  4. Organicism
  5. Value Theory
  6. Socialism
  7. The Humanist Manifesto
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Roy Wood Sellars (July 9, 1880-Sept. 5, 1973), was born in Seaforth, Ontario, the second son of Ford Wylis and Mary Stalker Sellars. (Warren 2007, 211 lists Sellars’ birth year as 1883, but this is an aberration. Most sources, including Warren elsewhere, all give the 1880 date. See Warren 1970, xi-xxv; 1973, 19-22; 1975, Ch. 1; Frankena 1973-74.) His ancestors had migrated from the Glasgow region in Scotland to Nova Scotia and later moved to Ontario.  In Ontario, the Sellars’ clan married into the prestigious Wood family, which included a distinguished Captain from the War of 1812 (David Wood) and the acting commissioner of the North West Mounted Police and Commissioner of the Canadian Yukon Territory (Zachary Taylor Wood).  This made him a relative to the 12th president of the United States (Zachary Taylor).  Sellars also took great pride in the fact that one of his ancestors, Lord Stanley, appears in Bosworth Field in Shakespeare’s Richard III.

Roy’s father, Ford, had been a schoolteacher and a school principal until health considerations forced him to abandon that profession.  Thereafter, Ford studied at the Medical School at the University of Michigan and became a physician in 1882. After graduating from medical school, the Sellars family settled in Pinnebog, Michigan. As this was a small town, Roy’s youthful companions were farm boys. In his youth, Roy pursued swimming, baseball, and hockey, and retained an interest in sports all his life.  His father’s library was the only one in the neighbourhood, and though young Roy knew little about philosophy, he read Emerson and Carlyle and had numerous discussions with his father about medicine. In this small rural community, Roy’s intellectual gifts quickly set him apart and he was sent to the Ferris Institute in Big Rapids, Michigan to prepare for a university career.

Roy entered the University of Michigan in 1899, where he did his own cooking and washed dishes for his lodgings.  Due to his small-town, rural background, the insecure young boy felt unprepared for a university program but he resolved to “make a go of it” and, upon his graduation, was voted one of the top two scholars in the class.  He studied widely in both the arts and the sciences, including rhetoric and calculus.  Sellars received his B.A. in 1903 from the University of Michigan and went on to Hartford Theological Seminary, where he studied New Testament Greek, Hebrew, and Arabic (and read the Koran in the original). He acquired a critical historically and culturally grounded approach to religion and a sympathy for social liberalism and humanism that remained with him throughout his life. In 1904 Professor R.M. Wenley of the Department of Philosophy at Michigan recommended Sellars for a fellowship at the University of Wisconsin, where he studied for a time before returning to the University of Michigan as Professor Wenley’s replacement while the latter was on sabbatical leave. Apart from a brief stint at University of Chicago in the summer of 1906 and a year studying in Europe (either 1908-09 or 1909-10 – sources differ on this), Sellars remained at the University of Michigan for the remainder of his approximately 40-year career, first as an instructor and doctoral student (he earned the Ph.D. in 1908 or 09 – again, sources differ), and then as a member of the permanent faculty.

During his year in Europe Sellars studied at the Sorbonne and discussed the possibility of a naturalistic formulation of emergent evolution with Henri Bergson. Bergson in turn referred him to the scientist and vitalist Hans Driesch. Sellars went on to study with Driesch and the neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband at Heidelberg. The precise details of Driesch’s influence on Sellars are not known but it seems likely that he directed Sellars to the study of physiology.  After returning to Michigan from his European adventures, Sellars developed a new course in the philosophy of science in which he used James Ward’s Naturalism and Agnosticism, as well as texts by Huxley, Mach, Poincaré, and Pearson.  Many of his students at this time came from the physical and biological sciences. Sellars remained scientifically-oriented throughout his life, a trait which he passed to his son Wilfrid. Even when Sellars was inspired by Bergson’s romantic or mystical theory of creative evolution, he sought (much like Popper) to recast it in more “naturalistic” terms acceptable to the sciences. Sellars’ naturalistic bent put him at odds with his most ardent supporter, Professor Wenley. Although Wenley regarded him as his best student, he could not accept Sellars’ naturalism, and did not approve of the publication of Sellars’ thesis by the University.

Sellars enjoyed considerable teaching success. His course, “The Principles and Problems of Philosophy,” was favorably remembered by many alumni who found it a “liberating” experience, “like taking a cold bath” (Frankena, 1973-74, 230).Several of the students in his political philosophy course, in which he discussed democracy, communism, socialism, and fascism, remarked that though they had expected him to be a propagandist, the course turned out to be a good scholarly treatment of the issues with no discernible bias.  Sellars had earlier taught a course in elementary logic and eventually published a textbook based on that course.  It was a chance reading of that textbook by Charles Stevenson that led him to the study of philosophy and later become one of Sellars’ colleagues (Frankena, 1973-74, 230).

Sellars married his cousin Helen Maud Stalker, an intelligent and accomplished woman, in 1911.  He wrote the Preface to Helen’s translation (from the French) of Celestine Bougle’s Evolution of Values.  Helen provided Sellars with much support and they remained close until her death in 1962.  In 1912 and 1913, respectively, their two children, Wilfrid and Cecily, were born. Cecily become a state-employed psychologist in North Dakota, but was killed in an automobile accident in 1954, an event which impacted Sellars’ scholarly work for decades. Twenty years later, well into his 90’s, he was still working on papers that had been in progress at the time of her death.  Wilfrid Sellars went on to become a highly influential philosopher in the latter half of the 20th century who, like his father, emphasized a firm grounding in the history of philosophy, fluency in the sciences, and a systematic approach to philosophical problems. It is noteworthy that his son Wilfrid developed a sophisticated version of scientific realism that builds on his father’s critical realism. In fact, Wilfrid’s views are often similar in substance to his father’s even if they differ in language and style.

Sellars believed in a fruitful, reciprocal relationship between epistemology and ontology, but saw epistemology as philosophically basic.  His most vehement criticism of other philosophers was often that they were weak in epistemology, but he also considered himself a proud ontologist.  Sellars also had a strong interest in ethics, social philosophy, and political philosophy.  Indeed, Sellars belongedto a genre of philosophers, which includes his son Wilfrid, that is rare today, who believed that a philosopher must be knowledgeable in virtually all areas of philosophy. Sellars made contributions to epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, the philosophy of science, social and political philosophy, and the history of philosophy. He could discourse in an intelligent and informed a way about Heidegger, Sartre, and Bergson just as he could about Russell, Carnap, or Einstein.  He was as at home in a discussion about ethics or social and political philosophy as he was in logic or scientific method.

Sellars was an independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to pursue his own philosophical direction.He formulated what may have been the most viable form of realism in his era. He offered a course, titled “Main Concepts of Science,” that may have been the very first course offered anywhere in the philosophy of science.  He formulated evolutionary naturalism, the view that life and mind are emergent products of naturalistically conceived evolution (i.e., without invoking the supernatural element in Alexander or Bergson’s élan vital). He (1923b; 1938a) pioneered the identity theory of the “brain-mind,” which he called the “double knowledge emergence approach” to mind-brain identity.  Although his basic views changed little over his career, he was constantly reformulating, developing, and clarifying them.  In his later years he watched as many of his views became commonplace, without being recognized for his role in their genesis.  

Perhaps because of his fierce independence, Sellars often found himself out of the mainstream. Until 1930, philosophy was dominated by idealism and pragmatism, religion by theism, and social theory by capitalism, while Sellars was a realist, an atheist, and a socialist. Later, analytical philosophy came into dominance and fundamentalism resurged in religion, neither of which appealed to him. Socialism did eventually enjoy a resurgence, but it was Marxist and totalitarian while Sellars was committed to a more moderate and gradual reform of social institutions based on rational persuasion.  Sellars was also critical of the American philosophy in his day. He (1970a, vii; see also Warren, 1975, 28) once remarked that, amongst philosophers, it is “almost always a Sellars against the world”. He often felt that he was better understood by psychologists and biologists than by philosophers and that he was better understood in Europe than in America (Warren 1975, 25).

Nonetheless, Sellars was a respected member of the philosophical community in America and it is safe to say that he inspired a personal affection from many of his colleagues that is unusual. He served as Vice-President of the Eastern Division of the APA in 1918 and President of the Western Division in 1923. He was an energetic correspondent and carried on friendly discussions with Samuel Alexander, C. Judson Herrick, Lloyd Morgan, and Marvin Farber. He also corresponded with F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, C.A. Strong, and Donald Williams, and he debated with D.C. Macintosh, H.N. Wieman, and Sydney Hook.  In 1954 the journal Philosophy and Phenomenological Research devoted an entire issue to Sellars’ philosophy, and in 1964 Andrew Reck listed Sellars as one of the 10 most notable philosophers in recent American philosophy. At the University of Michigan the Roy Wood Sellars Chair was created in his honor and Bucknell University honored him by establishing the Roy Wood Sellars Lecture Series. The first Roy Wood Sellars Lectures were given by Warren and the second by Wilfrid Sellars with Roy Sellars in attendance. In 1970 Notre Dame University honored Roy in his 90th year with a symposium on his philosophy, including presentations by Andrew Reck, Wilfrid Sellars, and C.F. Delany.  Although Roybelonged to a generation of America’s greatest systematic philosophers, Frankena (1973-4, 231) observes that, with hindsight, Sellars may have been one of the most important of them.  However, the fact that his son Wilfrid has developed a powerful formulation of his father’s views may be the greatest testament to Roy Wood Sellars’ lasting achievement.

2. Critical Realism

Much of Sellars’ philosophical work is an attempt to replace outdated mythopoetical views about knowledge, religion, values, and so forth, by up-to-date scientifically grounded views.  Science, he holds, “builds” on common sense, but since it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, the philosopher’s job is to harmonize the common sense and scientific frameworks (1932a, v; 1973, 160-161).

In his first book, Critical Realism , he attempts to justify common sense realism, which is also the view of philosophers when they are not in a reflective mood (1916a, 6)—the view that people perceive real external objects, not just intermediaries of some kind. He also aims to clarify the relation of common sense realism to scientific knowledge: “We start from independent things; and not from percepts” (1916a, 3).  Sellars also argues against the main theories of perception of his day: idealism, representationalism, pragmatism, and positivism, all of which he saw as undermining common sense realism. Other versions of critical realism were espoused by Santanaya and Lovejoy.

The defence of common sense realism, he (1941b; 1959c) holds, requires a robust defence of the correspondence theory of truth.The basic error in those mistaken views of perception is the failure to distinguish between the content and object of perception (1922a, 70 n 4).  Since the content of perception is fixed by aspects of the organism, those mistaken theories wrongly infer that the object of perception is not independent of the perceiver.

Sellars’ critical realism requires real substances (as opposed to ideas, universals, impressions, and so forth) as objects of perception. He (1929c; 1970a, 32; 1973, 182, 346-348, 353) rejects “the historical desiccation of the category of substance,” that is, the whittling down of the Ancient and Medieval robust notion of substance to Locke’s “I know not what”. While representationalism, idealism, pragmatism, and positivism tend to volatize the object of perception into ideas, sensations, or a mere placeholder for properties, Sellars holds the normal objects of perception are real full-bodied independent substances.

Although Sellars’ critical (or “referential”) realism is “built up from” common-sense realism, it is not identical with common sense since the latter has not faced the problems arising from discrepancies in perception (See his 1922c; 1924b; 1927b; 1927c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1959b; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1970, 6-8, 13, 15-16, 17-27, 33-35, 161; see also Warren, 1975, 35, 37). Despite his defense of common sense realism,Sellars rejects the “naïve realism” that identifies the immediate datum of knowledge with objects in the world. He distinguishes between the common sense realism of the ordinary person and the crude philosophical understanding embodied in naïve realism, the view that in perception one actually “intuits” the object (1963; see also Warren, 1975, 36-7).  In opposition to that naïve view, he holds that in perception one interprets one’s sensations. The interpretation of sensations is not a purely intellectual process: “A gull does not in the Lockean way apprehend his sensation …. [It] looks through his sensation at the fish in the water. It is a one-step sensi-motor process” (See his 1970a, 118; 1973, 49-50, 161; 1975; and Warren, 1975, 38-45!).

Sellars holds that the biological basis of knowledge consists in the organism’s adjustment to its external environment, where both the internal adjustment of the organism and external factors must be taken into account.  He sees his version of critical realism as a “mediate realism” that attempts to do justice both to the contribution of the perceiving organism and the claims of objective knowledge. That is, he aims to do justice to both the real and the “ideal” sides of cognition. It is absolutely crucial, he (1922a, 76-77) stresses, to distinguish between the causal conditions of perception and the referential act of perceiving. Perception is the interpretation of sense mediated by factors both internal and external to the perceiving subject. These internal factors are not to be confused with the mechanism or processes that underlie perception (that is, the account of the internal mechanism or processes is not an account of the content of perception). By taking account of both the internal and external factors, he seeks to avoid the evils of both naïve realism and the non-realist view that the objects of perception are not independent of mind.

The attempt of simultaneous justice to both  the subjective contribution of the organism and  the claims of objective knowledge is no easy matter. Various critical realists could not always agree how best to formulate the view (See Ramsperger, 1967). For example, Sellars (1970a, 5) rejects the sort of critical realism espoused by Santayana that erects a barrier of essences between the perceiver and the external object. Perhaps his basic point is that human beings perceive independent objects with their sensations, but do not perceive sensations, essences, or other mental or ideal intermediaries themselves (Warren, 1975, 38, 42). Sellars (1970a, 114-5) stresses that the fact that the object is present to consciousness does not mean that it must be present within consciousness.

Although Sellars’ sometimes wrote as if his version of critical realism is definitive,few agree that it is unproblematic. Since he acknowledges the subjective contribution of the perceiver, it can resemble representationalism. Since, however, he emphasizes that perception is a direct perception of independent objects, it can resembles naïve realism. Sellars counters that critical realism is the view that human knowing is a direct knowledge of objects, but that this knowledge is mediated by “logical ideas” (See his 1970a, 113 and the “Epilogue on Berkeley” in his 1968).  The problem is that it is hard to see how knowledge can be both mediated and direct. The claim that one perceives independent objects via one’s sensations but does not perceive those sensations themselves is a fair negative point, but seems to require a more robust positive account of the precise role of sensations in the perception of external objects. Sellars’ version of critical realism is intriguing, but many feel it requires further clarification (Chisholm 1955; Herbert, 1994; Wright, 1994; Levine, 2007).  Perhaps this is why Sellars continued to return to the issue again and again over the decades (See his 1929a; 1929b; 1929c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1950a; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1965; 1969d, Ch’s 4-5; 1970a, 112-131; and so forth).

3. Evolutionary Naturalism

Sellars does not have a fully developed philosophy of science, this being more characteristic of his son’s generation, but he does have definite views about scientific method and about the close relation of science to philosophy, some of which do anticipate his son’s views.  Sellars’ conception of science and its relation to philosophy is intimately related to his own views of evolutionary naturalism.

In Sellars’ (1973, 160-1) view, science “builds” on common sense, but it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, and so forth. He rejects the monochrome Newtonian universe in favor of an evolution-generated hierarchy of different levels of emergent causality: Under certain favorable conditions, life emerges from matter and mind from life (See his 1920c; 1922a, Ch. IX; 1924a; 1927a; 1933a; 1944b; 1959a; 1932, 4; 1969d, 64-68; and 1973, 290).  He is committed to the emergence of downward causal forces. That is, while the emergence of higher-order entities is causally dependent upon lower-order entities (bottom-up causation), once they emerge, the former may causally influence the latter (top-down causation) in ways not reducible to bottom-up causation (see Roy’s 1970, 38, 44-46 and Meehl and Sellars 1956). Sellars insists that the higher emergent entities are still material systems.

Although he does not deny the possibility of reductions in special cases, his conception of science is generally anti-reductionist (1922a, 16, 332; 1970, 136, 141, 240-1; Warren, 1975, 29).This explains why he holds that the scientific method cannot be identified with that of any particular science, such as physics (Warren, 1975, 29). When he (1932a, 5) describes his own view as physicalism, he does not mean physicalism in the more familiar sense but a view that accepts his own critical realism and emergence. Each of the sciences; natural, psychological, and social, treats of a particular domain in the emergent hierarchy, but none is privileged over the others.

The commitment to real independent substances in his critical realism dovetails with his evolutionary naturalism. The different levels in the emergent hierarchy are not just of events or properties, but of substances (1922a, Ch. XIII; 1932a, Ch. XII; 1943c; 1959a; 1970, 215).  Though the higher emergent levels are not reducible to material mechanisms, they do not introduce new non-natural forces. Life and mind are not non-natural forces entering nature from outside, but emergent capacities of natural substances (See his 1917b, 276-283; 1922a, vii-ix, 277-278, 333-336; 1933a; 1950b). See Emmet (1932, 222-23) for Whitehead’s very different Platonistic view)!

Sellars tends not to employ the classical formulation of emergence, that certain wholes are “greater than the sum of their parts”.  He (1922a, 302) does, however, use such formulations occasionally. See also his remarks on the relations of wholes and parts (1917a, 31, 145, 288). Since he talks of new unitary substantial wholes, talk of separable “parts” may be seen as misleading.Wilfrid Sellars (1949) clarifies his father’s somewhat obscure views. In general, however, in language reminiscent of Bergson but understood naturalistically, Sellars (1922a, viii, 17, 139, 167, 214-215, 297, 303, 322, 335, and so forth; 1932a, 3, 401; Blitz 2010) holds that modern science is beginning to accept the notion of “creative synthesis”, the view that change sometimes involves “the genesis of what Locke called ‘real essences’”.For a discussion of the classical part-whole formulations of emergence see McDonough (2002).

Agential causality, which is central to Sellars’ ethics, is underwritten by his evolutionary naturalism (1970a, 262-267). Agential causality emerges at a certain level of evolution and organization (1970a, viii; 1973a, Ch. 15). Human beings possess no “pushbutton free will,” but rather, an emergent capacity of the human brain is able to develop new judgments and standards that make a causal difference in behaviour (1932a, 396, 405; 1957a; 1959a; 1970a, 305; 1973a, 290-1, 361-384). He called his view “critical anthropomorphism” (1917b, 278).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism colors his view of the relation between science and philosophy. The diversity of the various irreducible levels in the emergent hierarchy requires a diversity of distinct autonomous sciences: physics, chemistry, biology, and so forth.  This yields problems with which none of the special sciences are prepared to deal.  The physicist can describe the behaviour of subatomic particles, but, qua physicist, is unfamiliar with the regularities and properties at higher levels in the emergent hierarchy. Similar points, in reverse, can be made about the biologist (psychologist, sociologist, and so forth), who are familiar with the objects at their higher levels of the hierarchy, but qua biologist, psychologist, sociologist, and so forth, are unfamiliar with the laws and properties at the lower levels.  Since, however, the evolutionary naturalist holds that the different levels in the emergent hierarchy constitute autonomous regions that fall outside any of the particular sciences, and since the items at different levels of the emergent hierarchy are linked in interesting ways that cannot be captured by reductions of one level to another, knowledge of the interrelations between these levels requires a different sort of knowledge, not possessed by any of the special sciences.

It is the distinctive job of the philosopher to obtain an overview of the relations between the different sciences, and between the sciences and the common sense framework, harmonize the new levels in the emergent hierarchy with each other and with the more stable and fixed background of inorganic nature (1922a, 263, 329; 1932a, 44ff, 79ff, 92ff).  Thus, philosophy completes science. “The job of philosophy is to size up the whole situation; and it often needs new leads” (1973, 161).One can see here the general outlines of his son’s (1991, 2, 18-19, 34, and so forth) view, that the distinctive job of philosophy is to obtain a synoptic view of the way things hang together, in the broadest sense.

Sellars published Evolutionary Naturalism in 1922, a year before both Morgan’s Emergent Evolution and Alexander’s “Natural Piety” (Warren, 1970, vi), although the latter two came to be better known for the formulation of emergent evolution. Warren (1973b) remarks that Morgan told Sellars that to his knowledge, Sellars was the first to publish on emergent evolution.  Bergson’s Creative Evolution, first published in 1907, does precede Sellars’ publications, but it differs in that it posits the non-scientific élan vital. Sellars saw his position as more systematic, empirical, and naturalistic than Bergson’s and Morgan’s since it does not introduce any non-natural controlling factors. Although Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism fell out of favor as reductionism gained ground, emergentism has once again arisen as a viable position in science, philosophy and religion (Beckermann, Kim, and Flores 1992; Hasker 2001; McDonough 2002; Davies and Clayton 2008, Blitz 2010; Vintiadis, and so forth).

4. Organicism

Although Sellars (1991, 415, 433) states that no other writer in recent times had challenged him as much, he claims that his own view deserves the title “philosophy of organism” more than Whitehead’s.  This is because Sellars sees living organisms as substantial wholes, whereas Whitehead sees them as a societies or nexuses of more fundamental entities. Sellars (1922a, vii-ix, 164-168) sees an organism as a product of emergent evolution in which simpler materials at a lower level are organized into new integrated substances with new causal powers at higher levels in the hierarchy. This higher-order substance is a true unity and not, as for Whitehead, a plurality (see Roy’s 1961b).

The living organism is, for Sellars, the background against which consciousness must be understood (1922a, 63, 298; 1932a, 446-7; 1949b, 95, 99). This leads him (1991, 415; 1970, 205) to agree with contemporaneous developments in physics, chemistry, biology, and psychology that emphasize fields and Gestalten, both of which are wholes that are not reducible to more fundamental entities.  Even so, the focus on the important organismic background should not lead one to confuse knowledge of the object with knowledge about the organism (1922a, 186-187). For similar reasons, he does not see a person as a combination of two separable substances as in Cartesian Dualism. He (1991, 415) describes his own position, which rejects the vitalistic and non-evolutionary elements in classical Aristotelianism, as an “Aristotelianism of the Left”. The same considerations lead him (1932a, 14-15; 1961b; 1973, 354-56; 1991, 416-7) to oppose the “reformed subjectivism” which he saw as the source both of the Platonism and rejection of naturalism and humanism in Whitehead’s philosophy of organism.

5. Value Theory

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism make values “centripetal” to human life and supports a humanistic theory of ethics and religion (1932a, 448; 1948b; 1949b, 78; 973, Ch. 14), all of which he counts as a virtue  He holds that human freedom emerges at a certain level or organization of organic development and lends a dignity and meaning to human life that is absent in a purely mechanical cosmos (1957a; 1949b, 103-4; 1970, 319-331).  Whereas the “old materialism” had been criticized as being unable to accommodate higher values, Sellars sees it as a virtue of his “new materialism” that it “flowers into humanism” (See also his 1932a, 19; 1944b; 1950b, 427-428). The emergence of living organisms from inorganic nature is a necessary condition for the existence of a world of values (1932a, 446-7).  It is people and human institutions that form the “hot center” of conscious life, while the inorganic world forms the “periphery and yet absolute condition for the whole drama” (1932a, 450).

Sellars is generally averse to ontological dualisms (1916a, 204, 245; 1922, 3091973a, Ch. 14; see also Sellars, McGill, and Farber, 1949) and holds they have done particular damage in value theory (see Roy’s 1917b, Ch. XVI; 1918, Ch. XII and Ch. XVI; 1921a; 1950b; Warren, 1975, 27, 41-2).  In general, he holds that each side in value-dualisms captures some fragment of the truth, but in their pure forms such dualisms are incapable of yielding a coherent theory of value.  Whereas some theories emphasize the objective basis, and others the subjective basis, for values, Sellars’ aims to do justice both “to the possibilities in the object and in the subject,” while taking “as objective a view of value as possible” (1932a, 445, 475; 1969d, Ch. 12). He sees this as an area where compromise and balance are essential. Value judgments are similar to cognitive judgments in some ways, but different in others. One can make mistakes in value judgments just as in cognitive judgments, but physical science does not discover values as properties of objects (1932a, 445; 1973, 344).  Rather, values are an interpretation of objects as having the capacity to affect human life in ways important to an individual or group (1932a, 445, 459-473; Warren 1975, 40).

In cognitive judgments, human beings regard themselves as disclosing the object itself, while in value judgments human beings are estimating the object with respect to its bearing on human life (1932a, 46).When the subjectivist claims that values are based on feelings, Sellars agrees, but holds that these subjective feelings are directed towards facts that can be objectively criticized. When the objectivist claims that values are based on objective facts, Sellars agrees, but holds that these facts only have value when “estimated with respect to human living” (1932a, 444). In valuing we are constrained by objective factors just as in perceiving, but we are also “interpreting” the object in the light of factors which are taken to be intimately linked to the self (1932a, 471; 1970, 244, 253, and so forth). It is important to acknowledge that Sellars (1922a, 29-30, 194-5, 312; and see and Wood, 1950, 525) does see the need for a kind of dualism in epistemology.

Sellars subjects “absolutism” and “factualism” about values to similar criticisms.  He (1932a, 457-459) rejects belief in absolute or intrinsic values since “a good which is not good for someone strikes me as meaningless”.  He (1932a, 16ff) describes “Eleatic views” that deny the significance of everyday beliefs as versions of “illusionism”. Similarly, when the “factualist” attempts to reduce values to some fact about human beings or human groups, for example, the fact that human beings prefer certain things and not others, Sellars (1932a, 452-3; 1970a, 245) replies that people are not like stones with only one possible reaction.  That is, alluding to his critique of “naïve realism”, these various “facts” are always really only some naïve immediate value (1932a,452). Even if some authority, for example, a church or an anthropologist, holds X is good, it is always possible to criticize that naïve immediate valuation by estimating its effect on human life. No authority, neither religious nor “scientific”, is immune to criticism.

Sellars (1932a, 446-7) stresses that “the background” to judgments of value is the emergent level of living organisms presupposed by the existence of value.Since an organism emerges from inorganic nature in the evolutionary process, his evolutionary naturalism is an essential part of his account of the genesis of the complex subject-object situations required for the existence of value (1922a, Ch. XV; 1932a, 68, 442; 1970a, 248-9, 267). Referring to his “open ended” emergent evolutionism (1970a, 267), he states that his “metaphysics of ethics in many ways represents its culmination” and that any attempt to explain the existence of value by reference to mere lifeless nature cannot succeed (1973, 359-60).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism is not just another version of materialism, but is enriched by his belief in the evolution of an emergent hierarchy containing the higher levels organisms and persons (1950b, 420, 422-6; 1970a, 154-173).  His naturalism “does not,” as some older versions of materialism, focused only on the physical sciences, did, “ignore the specialized areas of human living, morals, art, politics” (1932a, 449). Because man is “not just a knower but an agent” and a “desirer of good things”, the philosopher, in order to avoid an overly narrow conception of the human situation, must turn to the poets for a sense of “creative agency and decision” (1932a, 449).

6. Socialism

In The Next Step in Democracy (1916b) Sellars defends his own version of socialism (See also his 1970a, 272-73, 277-79, 289, 311, 334). Sellars distinguishes three stages of socialism: (1) the Utopian socialism of Fourier and Saint-Simon, (2) the “political socialism” that began with Marx’s Communist Manifesto, and (3) the later modification of Marx’s socialism based on an updated understanding of how society and people really work (1944-45b; 1970a, 272). The political socialism of Marx is called “scientific socialism” by its admirers, “orthodox socialism” by its critics (1970a, 279ff).

Sellars also rejects Utopian socialism as naïve and romantic, having little understanding of the obstacles to the creation of a genuine socialist society (1970a, 81). In contrast to the Utopian socialists, Sellars promotes a gradual modification of existing institutions in the light of new scientific advances with a full awareness that any “reckless unsettling” of the social foundations leads to disaster (1970a, 280, 292-293).  Sellars rejected the program to overthrow tradition on the basis of naïve romantic dreams of wishful thinking.

Although Sellars (1970a, 28-287) sees Marx as a fairly realistic and concrete “sort”, he holds that Marx was misled by revolutionary ardour into seeing history as a constant war of class struggle. Sellars, by contrast, sees the Marxian stage of socialism, not so much scientific as realistic, but he thinks Marxist realism (the recognition that the old order will not easily give way to rational persuasion) led to the introduction of a dangerous militancy into socialism. Further, whereas many saw Marx’s determinism as a strength, Sellars takes Marx’s view that capitalist society contains the seeds of its own destruction as empirically falsified (1970a, 308). Further, Marx underestimated the ability of capitalism to make adjustments (1970a, 284, 286, 307-8; 1944-45b).  Sellars (1970a, 287, 303-304) replaces Marx’s “semi-mechanical and almost wholly deterministic” outlook by the view that the people must learn to emancipate themselves by participation in the political process. Participation in the democratic process requires the development of the necessary virtues: cooperation and ingenuity, the application of continuous experiments to find out what works best, the determination and patience to approach the ultimate goal by slow degrees (1970a, 287).  Whereas Marx seems to absolve the individual of responsibility for the eventual outcome by representing the march towards the goal as the inevitable result of the great supra-individual forces of history, Sellars (1971a, 333-334) emphasizes the essential educative role of the individuals participation in the process that renders the individual prepared for and worthy of the final goal. Although Sellars was sometimes seen as a radical in his day (1970a, 272), he defines socialism as a democratic movement whose aim is to secure the greatest justice and liberty for the maximum number of people at any given time, without the wholesale overturning of tradition by violent methods (1943d).  In opposition to the militant socialism of old, he presents a moderate democratic recipe for achieving socialist goals via “rational reform” while escaping the “vicious dialectic of hate and counter-hate” (1970a, 291, 304). Progress cannot be achieved by one side imposing its view on the whole but by the “interplay” of conservatives on the one side and liberals on the other that the direction and speed of social progress is determined” (1916b, 3; 1970a, 307-308).

7. The Humanist Manifesto

Early in his studies, Sellars considered a career in comparative religion, but with his usual idiosyncratic twist, he wished to do so from a scientific, humanistic, and atheistic point of view. In Evolutionary Naturalism, he describes the religious impulse as “one of the most admirable … in human nature” (1922, 5; see also his 1918, 26 and his 1969a, Ch. 11), but he also holds that religion must be “brought to the world disclosed through science” (1918, 44-45, 222; see also Warren 1975, 24-25).  Given his naturalism, the appeal to supernatural entities and explanations must be eliminated and replaced by an emphasis on human flourishing as citizens of a shared world (Wilson, 1995, Ch. 17).  Whereas religions traditionally conceived salvation as something that comes to man from the outside, Sellars (1918, 12) sees it as something that must arise out of the “loyal union” of human beings who share a belief in the values of life. Traditional religions also often see creation as completed, meaning that a person’s job is merely to understand the pattern in order to follow it, Sellars (1947), reflecting Bergson’s influence, holds that people must learn to recognize creation as “a going concern,” in which their contribution to the further emergence of the universe is essential.

In 1932, Sellars was approached by Raymond Bragg on behalf of a Chicago-based group of humanists associated with The New Humanist (for which Bragg was an associate editor). The group had for some time been contemplating the need for an official statement of the religious humanist position, but recognizing the difficulties inherent in group authorship, chose to have a complete first draft written by a single author. After hearing him lecture in Chicago, Bragg approached Sellars about the project and Sellars accepted with the unanimous support of the Chicago group.  The document published in the following year, the Humanist Manifesto of 1933 (or Humanist Manifesto I), is the result of numerous revisions by multiple contributors upon Sellars’ original draft. While that draft has been lost to history, the fact that Sellars signed the 1933 document, and later-on claimed primary authorship of it, suggests that whatever changes were made did not, in his mind, affect the substance of what he had written. For these reasons it has Sellars as the pre-eminent author of the Manifesto, although that is not to minimize the contributions of others.

In the Manifesto, Sellars attempts to put the essence of his religious humanism into a form suitable not just for fellow professors, but for the general public. It is important to remember that along with many of the original signers of the Humanist Manifesto I, Sellars conceived of humanism not as a replacement for religion but as a new religion (1918, Ch. XVI; 1969d, Ch. 11; Wilson 1995, Ch. 17).  Nevertheless, his naturalized religion shades inevitably into a this-worldly humanist philosophy that, he (1932a, 7) holds, attempts to blend “those two great naturalists, Spinoza and Nietzsche, uniting the passion for life of the one with the cosmic calm of the other.”

Humanist Manifesto I was conceived as the statement of a new secular religion designed to replace the old religions that had been founded on claims of supernatural revelation, or on fear and helplessness (1918c, Foreword).  It opposes an acquisitive and profit-motivated society, and outlines a mutually cooperative worldwide society committed to the rational resolution of problems. Thirty-four of sixty-five persons asked to sign did, including Edwin Burtt of Cornell, and John Dewey and John Hermann Randall of Columbia. About one-third of the signatories were professors from the University of Chicago and from Columbia University; about half were Unitarians (Wilson 1995, Ch. 10).

The Manifesto contains fifteen theses (briefly summarized here):

  1. The universe is self-existing, not created.
  2. Man is a part of nature that has emerged in a continuous process.
  3. Since humanists hold an organic view of life, they reject the traditional mind-body dualism.
  4. Man’s religious culture is a result of gradual natural development as a result of  man’s interaction with the natural environment and social heritage.
  5. Science has shown that supernatural and cosmic guarantors of human values are unsupported, so religion must re-formulate its views in the light of scientific knowledge.
  6. Theism, modernism, and other varieties of “new thought” have been surpassed.
  7. The distinction between the secular and the religious cannot be defended any longer: Nothing that is human is alien to religion.
  8. The purpose of man’s life is the complete realization of the possibilities in human personality.
  9. Humanists find their religious feelings expressed in an intensified sense of their personal lives and the cooperative effort to produce social well-being.
  10. There are no uniquely religious emotions connected with the supernatural.
  11. Man must discourage sentimental hopes and wishful thinking and face the challenges of life by embracing rational procedures.
  12. Religious humanists aim to enhance the creative element in man in order to add to produce a more meaningful life.
  13. All social associations should exist for the promotion of human flourishing.
  14. A socialized cooperative economic system must be established for the fair distribution of the necessities of life to all human beings.
  15. Religious humanists seek to affirm human life rather than deny it, seek to discover the full possibilities of life, not run from them, and aim to establish the conditions of a just and meaningful life for all, not just the privileged few.

For a complete statement of the theses, see Sellars (1970a, 331-335).

Some humanists declined to sign Manifesto I. Dr. Arthur Morgan stated several differences of emphasis, but also some more substantial objections (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Anticipating recent views in “deep ecology” (See Sessions, 1995), Morgan felt that Manifesto I placed too much emphasis on human life and failed to recognize that there may be significance in other life-forms. Morgan called for a “race of businessmen” which sees business as a public trust, not a means to personal enrichment, and he objected to the “unjustified cocksureness” of Manifesto I, feeling that it is “not dictated by humility or imagination”. Morgan also felt that though religion should be disciplined by science, it should not be limited by it.  His most biting criticism was that many humanists are “not strong in faith, hope, and love.”

John Haynes Holmes, the prominent Unitarian minister and noted pacifist, declined to sign Manifesto I since he objected to the rejection of theism in the 6th thesis, holding instead that a rational humanism “inevitably unfolds into a rational theism” (Wilson 1995,Ch. 7). He also found terms like “modernism,” in the 6th thesis “hopelessly vague” and wondered why a humanist could not claim to represent the best of modernism. Although he found the deism of some of the authors “not half bad,” he insists that “Theism … is the blossom that grows on the plant of humanism, the poetry into which it unfolds in mystic beauty”.

Howard Shapley, a Harvard astronomer, spoke for many scientists who were reluctant to make judgments about religion: “As a social philosopher I am embryonic and I have decided that I should not misuse my position by pretending to intelligence or comprehension in a field in which my thoughts have been too scattered and probably too prejudiced” (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Although Shapley agrees with current traditions of protecting the weak, he is not sure that this is in keeping with “the biological traditions of the planet”. His point is not that the weak should not be protected, but that, as a scientist, he cannot claim to know this, and, therefore, he should not put his authority as a scientist behind the claim.

In his retrospective on Humanist Manifesto I, Wilson remarks that he now feels it to be a mistake to tie humanism directly to socialism. Humanism should not be tied to any particular economic system, but should concern itself with the more general goals of ending disease, poverty, ignorance, prejudice, and so forth (Wilson 1995, Ch. 18).

Later versions of the Manifesto found their own objections.  Humanist Manifesto II found the language in Manifesto I to be “far too optimistic” about the possibility of eliminating social evils. Frances Schaeffer (2005) authored A Christian Manifesto (in opposition to the Communist Manifesto) which holds that both the humanist and communist Manifestos, despite significant differences between them, tend to foster similar forms of social degeneration. Schaeffer sees humanism as the unfortunate view that man is the measure of all things, and holds that even if that is not the humanist’s intention Manifesto I undermines the ideals of objective truth and morality. One major difference between Manifesto I and later humanist Manifestos and statements is that Manifesto I arose out of religious humanism (1918, Ch. XVI), and was, accordingly, much more sympathetic to religion per se than these later documents.

The objections by various humanists, both earlier and later, to signing Humanist Manifesto I show just how difficult it is to obtain agreement on such a central issue from such a diverse group of intellectuals representing different fields and backgrounds. Nevertheless, despite the various objections and reservations to Manifesto I, and the various replacement manifestos and declarations that appeared in later years, Manifesto I remains a significant historical document in the genesis of the humanist movement, and one that Sellars, who, it is probably fair to say, is “the principal author” of the published version, played an fundamental role in creating.

8. References and Further Reading

Several of Roy Wood Sellars’ works can be obtained in electronic form at The Internet ArchiveThe Autodidact Project and the online library of The Secular Web. Additional information on the various versions of the Humanist Manifestos and The Amsterdam Declaration is available online from the International Humanist and Ethical Union, the American Humanist Association, and the Council for Secular Humanism.

a. Primary Sources

  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1902. "Re-interpretation of Democracy.” Inlander (University of Michigan publication), 12: 252-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907a. "The Nature of Experience." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods: 14-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907b. "A Fourth Progression in the Relation of Body and Mind." Psychological Review 14: 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907c. "Professor Dewey's View of Agreement." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 4 (16): 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908a. "An Important Antinomy." Psychological Review 15 (4): 237-249.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908b. "Consciousness and Conservation." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (9): 235-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908c. "Critical Realism and the Time Problem I." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (20): 542-48.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908d. "Critical Realism and the Time Problem II." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (27): 597-602. 
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909a. "Causality." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 6: 323-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909b. "Space." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods. 6: 617-23.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1912. "Is There a Cognitive Relation?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 9 (9): 225-328.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1915. "A Thing and its Properties." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 12 (12): 318-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1916a. Critical Realism: A Study of the Nature and Conditions of Knowledge. Chicago: Rand-McNally and Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1916b. The Next Step in Democracy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917a. The Essentials of Logic. Boston: Houghton Mifflin Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917b. The Essentials of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918a. "An Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Philosophical Review 27 (2): 150-63.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918b. "On the Nature of Our Knowledge of the External World." Philosophical Review 27 (5): 502-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918c. The Next Step in Religion. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918d. “Review of P. Coffey, Epistemology, Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 15: 557-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919a. "The Epistemology of Evolutionary Naturalism." Mind 28 (112): 407-26.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919b. “Review of George Wobbermin, Christian Belief in God.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 16: 277-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920a. "The Status of Categories." The Monist 30 (2): 220-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920b. "Space and Time." The Monist 30 (3): 321-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920c. "Evolutionary Naturalism and the Mind-Body Problem." The Monist 30 (4): 568-98.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920d. "Knowledge and Its Categories." Essays in Critical Realism, R.W. Sellars, Durant Drake, A.O. Lovejoy, James Pratt, Arthur Rogers, George Santayana, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 187-219.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920e. “Review of J. A. Leighton, The Field of Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 17: 79-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920f. "Preface." to Evolution of Values, Helen Maud Sellars, (trans.). New York: Henry Holt.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921a. "Epistemological Dualism versus Metaphysical Dualism." Philosophical Review 30 (5): 482-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921b. "The Requirement of an Adequate Naturalism." The Monist 31 (2): 249-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922a. Evolutionary Naturalism. Chicago: Open Court.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922b. "Is Consciousness Physical?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 19 (25): 690-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922c. "Concerning 'Transcendence' and 'Bifurcation'" Mind 31 (121): 31-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1923a. "Le Cerveau, L'âme et La Conscience." Bulletin de la Société Francais de Philosophie: 1-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1923b (some sources say 1922). "The Double Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, N.S. 23: 55-70 (reprinted in Principles of Emergent Realism: 188-201).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924a. "The Emergence of Naturalism." International Journal of Ethics 34 (4): 309-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924b. "Critical Realism and Its Critics." Philosophical Review 33 (4): 379-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926a. The Principles and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926b. "Cognition and Valuation," Philosophical Review 35 (2): 124-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927a. "Realism and Evolutionary Naturalism: A Reply to Professor Hoernlé." The Monist. 37 (1): 150-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927b. "Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States." The Monist 37 (4): 503-520.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927c. "What is the Correct Interpretation of Critical Realism?," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 24 (9): 238-241.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927d. "Why Naturalism and Not Materialism?," Philosophical Review 36 (3): 215-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928a. Religion Coming of Age. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928b. "Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States." Philosophy Today Edward L. Schaub, (ed.). Chicago and London (reprint from The Monist, 1927): 19-36.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929a. "Current Realism." Anthology of Recent Philosophy D. S. Robinson, (ed.). New York: Thomas Y. Crowell Co. (re-print from Philosophy Today): 279-290.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929b. "A Re-examination of Critical Realism." Philosophical Review 38 (5): 439-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929c. "Critical Realism and Substance." Mind 38 (152): 473-88. Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 13-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930a. "A Naturalistic Interpretation of Religion." The New Humanist 3 (4): 1-4.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930b. "Realism, Naturalism and Humanism." in Contemporary American Philosophy G. P. Adams and W. P. Montague, v. 2. (eds.), New York: Macmillan: 261-85.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1931. "Humanism, Viewed and Reviewed." The New Humanist 4 (15): 12-16.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932a. The Philosophy of Physical Realism. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932b. "Reinterpretation of Relativity." Philosophical Review 41 (5): 517-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933a. "L'Hypothèse de l'Émergence." Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 40 (3): 309-24.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933b. "Religious Humanism." The New Humanist 6 (3): 7-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood (Drafter and co-signer). May-June, 1933c. "Humanist Manifesto." The New Humanist 6 (3): 58-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933d. "In Defense of the Manifesto." The New Humanist 6 (6): 6-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933e. “Review of Durant Drake, Introduction to Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 3: 667-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1934. "Nature and Naturalism." The New Humanist 7 (2): 1-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935a. “Review of C. F. Gauss, Primer for Tomorrow.” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review. 41: 465-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935b. "George S. Morris." Dictionary of American Biography 13: 208-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1937a. "Critical Realism and the Independence of the Object." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 34 (20): 541-550.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1937b. "Henry Philip Tappan." Dictionary of American Biography 18: 302-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938a. "An Analytic Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Philosophical Review 47 (5): 461-87.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938b. "A Statement of Critical Realism." Revue Internationale de Philosophie 3: 472-496.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939a. "Positivism in Contemporary Philosophical Thought." American Sociological Review: 26-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939b. "A Clarification of Critical Realism." Philosophy of Science 6 (4): 412-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1940. "Knowledge and its Categories." The Development of American Philosophy, W. G. Muelder and Laurence Sears, (ed’s). Cambridge, Mass: 431-40  (Reprinted from Drake, Durant. 1920. Essays in Critical Realism. New York: Gordian Press: 187-219)
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941a. "Humanism as a Religion." The Humanist 1 (1): 5-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941b. "A Correspondence Theory of Truth." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 38 (24): 653-54.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942a. "Aspects of Democracy II: the Quality of Democracy." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942b. "Galileo Galilei." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 301-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942c. “Review of E. Gilson, God and Philosophy.” The Humanist 2: 36-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942-43. "Dewey on Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 3 (4): 381-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943a. "Science , Philosophy, and Religion." The Humanist 3: 84-5.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943b. "Verification of Categories: Existence and Substance" Journal of Philosophy 40 (8): 197-205.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943c. "Causality and Substance." Philosophical Review.”.  52 (1): 1-27 (Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 26-45).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1943d. "Reason and Revolution," Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review  49: 212-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943e. “Review of J. Maritain, Education at the Cross Roads.” The Humanist 3: 165-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944a. "Causation and Perception." Philosophical Review 53 (6): 534-56.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944b. "Reformed Materialism and Intrinsic Endurance." Philosophical Review. 53: 359-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944c. "Is Naturalism Enough?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (September): 533-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944d. "Does Naturalism Need Ontology?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (25): 686-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944e. "Can a Reformed Materialism Do Justice to Values?" Ethics 55 (1): 28-45.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45a. "The Meaning of True and False." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (1): 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45b. "Reflections on Dialectical Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (2): 157-79.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45c. "Knowing and Knowledge." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 341-344.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45d.  "Knowing through Propositions." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 348-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1945-46. “Review of Yervant Krikorian, Naturalism and the Human Spirit." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  6: 436-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946a. "A Note on the Theory of Relativity." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods  43 (12): 309-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946b. "Materialism and Relativity: A Semantic Analysis." Philosophical Review 55 (1): 25-51.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946c. "Philosophy and Physics of Relativity." Philosophy of Science 13 (3): 177-95.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946-47. "Positivism and Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  7 (1): 12-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1947. "Accept the Universe as a Going Concern." Religious Liberals Reply Henry Wieman, (ed.). Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1948a. "Do the Natural Sciences Have a Need of the Social Sciences?," Philosophy of Science  15 (2): 104-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948b. "Naturalistic Humanism." Religion in the Twentieth Century Vergilius Ferm, (ed.). New York: Littlefield and Adams (later edition date 1958): 415-31.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948c. “Review of A. N. Whitehead, Essays in Science and Philosophy." The Humanist  8: 92-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949a. "Social Philosophy and the American Scene." Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed.’s). New York: Macmillan: 61-75.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949b. "Materialism and Human Knowing." Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 75-106.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949c. "Resume of W. Cook Foundation Lectures.” (delivered by Ralph Barton Perry), Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 55: 185-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood, McGill, V.J., Farber, Marvin. 1949. Forward to Philosophy for the Future, R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: v-xii.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1949-50. “Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 10: 586-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950a. "Critical Realism and Modern Materialism." Philosophical Thought in France and the United States, Marvin Farber, (ed.). Buffalo: The University of Buffalo Publications: 463-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950b. "The New Materialism." A History of Philosophical Systems V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 418-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950c. “Review of Frank Chapman Sharp, Good Will and Ill Will," The Humanist.  10: 277-8
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1950d. "Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 56: 175-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950-51. "The Spiritualism of Lavelle and Le Senne." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 11 (3): 386-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951. "Professor Goudge's Queries with Respect to Materialism." Philosophical Review 60 (2): 243-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1951-52a. "Review of R. W. Boynton, Beyond Mythology." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 146-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951-52b.  "Review of Charles Mayer, “Man: Mind or Matter." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 436-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1952. “Le spiritualisme de Louis Lavelle et de René le sense.” Les Études Philosophiques 9(1/2): 30-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1955. "My Philosophical Position: A Rejoinder." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 16 (1): 72-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956a. "Physical Realism and Relativity: Some Unfinished Business." Philosophy of Science  23 (2): 75-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956b. "Gestalt and Relativity: An Analogy." Philosophy of Science 23 (4): 275-279.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1957a. "Guided Causality, Using Reason and 'Free Will'." Journal of Philosophy 54 (August): 485-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1957b. "Philosophical Orientation and Peace." The Idea of War and Peace in Contemporary Philosophy Irving Louis Horowitz, (ed.). New York: vii-xx (The book was re-released by Literary Licensing Publisher in 2012).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959a. "Levels of Causality: The Emergence of Guidance and Reason in Nature." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  20 (1): 1-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1959b. "Sensations as Guides to Perceiving." Mind 68 (January): 2-15.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959c. "'True' as Contextually Implying Correspondence." Journal of Philosophy 56 (18): 712-22.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood; Lamont, Corliss; Otto, Max; Huxley, Julien; Williams, Gardner; Randall Jr; John Herman. 1959. A Humanist Symposium on Metaphysics. Journal of Philosophy 56 (2): 45-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. October 1960. "Panpsychism or Evolutionary Materialism." Philosophy of Science 27 (October): 229-50.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1961a. "Referential Transcendence." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 22 (1): 1-15.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1961b. "Querying Whitehead's Framework." Revue Internationale de Philosophie 56-57: 135-66.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1962. "American Critical Realism and British Theories of Sense Perception I and II." Methodos: 61-108.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1963. "Direct, Referential Realism." in Dialogue 2 (02): 135-43.         
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1965. "Existentialism, Realistic Empiricism, and Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 25 (3): 315-32.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1968. Lending a Hand to Hylas. Ann Arbor: Edward Brothers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1969a. "A Possible Integration of Science and Philosophy," Zygon 4 (3): 293-97
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1969b. "Some Questions and Suggestions: An Exposition," Journal of Philosophy. 66 (24): 859-60
  • Sellars, R.W. 1969c. “Le naturalisme de Sellars,” Dialectica 23 (1): 79-80
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1969d. Reflections on American Philosophy from Within. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970a. Principles of Emergent Realism. W. Preston Warren, (ed.) . St. Louis: Warren H. Green.
  • This book is really the best place to obtain an overview of R.W. Sellars’ writings with both extensive primary sources and commentary over the course of his development.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970b. Social Patterns and Political Horizons. Nashville: Aurora Publishers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970c. Principles, Perspectives, and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Pageant Press International Corp.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973a. Neglected Alternatives: Critical Essays by Roy Wood Sellars. William. Preston Warren, (ed.), Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973b. January-February. "Toward a New Humanist Manifesto." The Humanist
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1973c. "Recollections of Marvin Farber." In Phenomenology and Natural ExistenceDale Riepe, (ed.). Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1975. Forward to William Preston Warren. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1991. “Philosophy of Organism and Physical Realism”. The Philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead. Paul A. Schlipp, (ed.). LaSalle: Open Court: 407-433 (Original publication date, 1941).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Avery, Jon Henry. 1989. “An Analysis and Critique of Roy Wood Sellars' Descriptive and Normative Theories of Religious Humanism.” PhD diss., The Iliff School of Theology and University of Denver.
  • Bahm, Archie, 1954. "Evolutionary Naturalism." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 1-12.
  • Baker, Richard R. 1950. “The Naturalism of Roy Wood Sellars,” New Scholasticism. 24 (1): 3-31.
  • Beckermann, Angsar, Flohr, Hans, Kim, Jaegwon. 1993. Emergence or Reduction: Essays on the Prospects of Non-Reductive Physicalism. Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Benjamin, Cornelius. 1934. Book Review: “The Philosophy of Physical Realism.” Roy Wood Sellars. Ethics. 44 (2): 270.
  • Bergson, Henri. 1998. Creative Evolution. Arthur Mitchell, (trans.). New York: Dover.
  • Blau, Joseph, 1952. Men and Movements in American Philosophy. New York: Prentice-Hall.
  • Blitz, David. 2010.  Emergent Evolution and Creative Novelty. New York: Springer.
  • Bogomolov, A.S. 1962. “Roy Wood Sellars in the Materialist Theory of Knowledge,” Russian Studies in Philosophy. 1 (3): 31-32.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1955. "Critical Realism," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 15 (1): 33-47.
  • Davies, Paul, Clayton, Philip, (ed’s). 2008.  The Re-Emergence of Emergence: The Emergentist Hypothesis from Science to Religion. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Delaney, C. F., 1969. Mind and Nature: A Study of the Naturalistic Philosophy of Cohen, Woodbridge and Sellars. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Delaney, C. F. 1971. "Sellars and the Contemporary Mind-Body Problem," The New Scholasticism 45: 245-68.
  • Emmet, Dorothy. 1932. Whitehead’s Philosophy of Organism. London: Macmillan.
  • Ferm, Vergilius. 1950. “Varieties of Naturalism,” A History of Philosophical Systems. V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 429-441.
  • Frankena, William. 1954. "Theory of Valuation," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 15 (1): 65-81.
  • Frankena, William. Dec. 1973. “Roy Wood Sellars: Obituary,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 34 (2): 300-301.
  • Frankena, William. 1973-74. “Roy Wood Sellars: Memoriam,” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 47: 230-232.
  • Gluck, Samuel E. 1971. Review of  Norman Paul Melchert’s Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Illinois: Charles C. Thomas. Philosophy 46 (177): 281ff.
  • Grayling, A.C. 2003. Meditations for the Humanist: Ethics for a Secular Age. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Griffin, James Phillip,  1966. “Foundations of Ethical Value in the Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars and William Temple.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Hasker, William. 2001. The Emergent Self. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Herbert, David. 1994. “A New Critical Realism: An Examination of Roy Wood Sellars’ Epistemology,” Transactions of the Charles Sanders Peirce Society 30 (3): 477 - 514.
  • Hoor, Marten. 1954.  "Humanism as a Religion," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 84-97.
  • Hudson, Yeager. 1965. “Metaphysical Causality in the Philosophies of Brand Blanshard, Roy Wood Sellars, and John Laird.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Iobst, Philip Kirschman. 1975. The Normative Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars: A Critical Examination, Ph. D. Dissertation, State University of New York at Buffalo
  • Kreyche, Robert.  1951. “The Naturalism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Ottawa.
  • Kuiper, John. 1954 (some references say 1955). "The Mind-Body Problem," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (September): 46-84.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1973. Humanist Manifestos I and II. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1981. “The Arrogance of Humanism,”  International Studies in Philosophy 13 (1):91-93.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1983. A Secular Humanist Declaration. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2000. Humanist Manifesto 2000: A Call for a New Planetary Humanism. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Levine, Steven. 2007. “Sellars’ Critical Direct Realism,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 15 (1): 53-76.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2007. What is Secular Humanism? Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Lamont, Corliss. 1997. The Philosophy of Humanism.  Washington, D.C: Humanist Press.
  • McDonough, Richard. 2002. “Emergence and Creativity: Five Degrees of Freedom,” Creativity, Cognition, and Knowledge Terry Dartnall, (ed.). Westport, Connecticut: Praeger: 283-321.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1964. “An Examination of the Physical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Pennsylvania.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1968. Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Ill.: Charles C. Thomas.
  • Munk, Arthur W. P. 1945. “Roy Wood Sellars' Criticism of Idealism.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Ramsperger, A.G.  1967. “Critical Realism” Encyclopedia of Philosophy, v. 2. Paul Edwards., (ed.) (New York: Macmillan and the Free Press: 262-263.
  • Reck, Andrew. 1962. Recent American Philosophy: Studies of Ten Representative Thinkers. New York: Pantheon Books.
  • Reck, Andrew. 1971. "The Realism of Roy Wood Sellars," The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 209-44.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1949. “Aristotelian Philosophies of Mind”. Philosophy for the Future, Roy Wood Sellars, V.J. McGill, Marvin Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 544-570.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1955. "Physical Realism," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 13-32.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, and Meehl, Paul. 1956. “The Concept of Emergence,” Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, v. 1.  Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press: 239-252.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1965. “The Identity Approach to the Mind-Body Problem,” Review of Metaphysics 18 (March): 430-51.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, 1971. "The Double-Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem," The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 269-89. (Note that Roy had published an article with the same title in 1923)
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1991. “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man,” Science, Perception and Reality Atascadero, California: Ridgeview: 1-40.
  • Schaeffer, Francis. 2005. A Christian Manifesto. Wheaton, Illinois: Crossway Books.
  • Sessions, George. 1995. Deep Ecology for the Twenty-First Century. Boston: Shambhal.
  • Slurink, Pouwel. 1996. “Back to Roy Wood Sellars: Why His Evolutionary Naturalism is Still Worthwhile,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 34 (3):425-44.
  • Rowntree, Clifford. 1964. “Direct, Referential Realism: A Comment,” Dialogue 2 (04): 452-453.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. 2002. “Emergence,” Philosophical Studies 58 (1-2): 53-63.
  • Trelo, Virgil J. 1966. The Critical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars. Lisle, Ill.: St. Procopius College.
  • Vintiadis, Elly. “Emergence,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy
  • Warren, William Preston. 1967. "Realism 1900-1930: An Emerging Epistemology," The Monist. 51 (2): 179-205.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1970. Introduction to Roy Wood Sellars. Principles of Emergent Realism, W. Preston Warren, (ed.). St. Louis: Warren H. Green: xi-xxiv.
  • Warren, William Preston, 1972a. "Foundations of Philosophy," Bucknell Review 19 (3): 69-100.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1972b. "Experimentalism Plus," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 33 (2): 149-82.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1973a. “A Brief Biography of Roy Wood Sellars,” Neglected Alternatives: Critical Essays by Roy Wood Sellars. W. Preston Warren, (ed.). Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press: 19-22.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1973b. Preface to Roy Wood Sellars’ Neglected Alternatives. Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press: 7-15.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1975. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • This book is probably the best sympathetic secondary source on R.W. Sellars’ views.
  • Werkmeister, W. H. 1981. History of Philosophical Ideas in the United States. New York: Ronald Press.
  • Warren, William Preston. 2007. “Roy Wood Sellars: Philosopher of Religious Humanism,” Notable American Unitarians, Herbert Vetter, (ed.).  Cambridge, Harvard Square Library: 211-213.
  • Wilson, Edwin. 1995. The Genesis of a Humanist Manifesto. Amherst, NY. Humanist Press.
  • Wood, Ledger. 1950. “Recent Epistemological Schools,” A History of Philosophical Systems, V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 516-539.
  • Wright, Edmund. 1994. “A New Critical Realism: An Examination of the Critical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars,” Transactions of the Charles Sanders Pierce Society 30 (3): 477-514.


Author Information

Richard McDonough
Arium School of Arts & Sciences

Leibniz: Logic

LeibnizThe revolutionary ideas of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) on logic were developed by him between 1670 and 1690. The ideas can be divided into four areas: the Syllogism, the Universal Calculus, Propositional Logic, and Modal Logic.

These revolutionary ideas remained hidden in the Archive of the Royal Library in Hanover until 1903 when the French mathematician Louis Couturat published the Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz. Couturat was a great admirer of Leibniz’s thinking in general, and he saw in Leibniz a brilliant forerunner of modern logic. Nevertheless he came to the conclusion that Leibniz’s logic had largely failed and that in general the so-called “intensional” approach to logic was necessarily bound to fail. Similarly, in their standard historiography of logic, W. & M. Kneale (1962) maintained that Leibniz “never succeeded in producing a calculus which covered even the whole theory of the syllogism”. Even in recent years, scholars like Liske (1994), Swoyer (1995), and Schupp (2000) argued that Leibniz’s intensional conception must give rise to inconsistencies and paradoxes.

On the other hand, starting with Dürr (1930), Rescher (1954), and Kauppi (1960), a certain rehabilitation of Leibniz’s intensional logic may be observed which was by and by supported and supplemented by Poser (1969), Ishiguro (1972), Rescher (1979), Burkhardt (1980), Schupp (1982), and Mugnai (1992). However, the full wealth of Leibniz’s logical ideas became visible only in Lenzen (1990), (2004a), and (2004b), where the many pieces and fragments were joined together to an impressive system of four calculi:

  • The algebra of concepts L1 (which turns out to be deductively equivalent to the Boolean algebra of sets)
  • The quantificational system L2 (where “indefinite concepts” function as quantifiers ranging over concepts)
  • A propositional calculus of strict implication (obtained from L1 by the strict analogy between the containment-relation among concepts and the inference-relation among propositions)
  • The so-called “Plus-Minus-Calculus” (which is to be viewed as a theory of set-theoretical containment, “addition,” and “subtraction”).

Table of Contents

  1. Leibniz’s Logical Works
  2. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism
    1. Axiomatization of the Theory of the Syllogism
    2. The Semantics of “Characteristic Numbers”
    3. Linear Diagrams and Euler-circles
  3. Works on the Universal Calculus
    1. The Algebra of Concepts L1
    2. The Quantificational System L2
    3. The Plus-Minus-Calculus
  4. Leibniz’s Calculus of Strict Implication
  5. Works on Modal Logic
    1. Possible-Worlds-Semantics for Alethic Modalities
    2. Basic Principles of Deontic Logic
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Abbreviations for Leibniz’s works
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Leibniz’s Logical Works

Throughout his life (beginning in 1646 in Leipzig and ending in 1716 in Hanover), Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz did not publish a single paper on logic, except perhaps for the mathematical dissertation “De Arte Combinatoria” and the juridical disputa­tion “De Conditionibus” (GP 4, 27-104 and AE IV, 1, 97-150; the abbrevi­ations for Leibniz’s works are resolved in section 6). The former work deals with some issues in the theory of the syllogism, while the latter contains investigations of what is nowadays called deontic logic. Leibniz’s main aim in logic, however, was to extend the traditional syllogistic to a “Universal Calculus.” Although there exist several drafts of such a calculus which seem to have been composed for publication, none of them was eventually sent to press. So Leibniz’s logical essays appeared only posthumously. The early editions of his philosophical works, however, contained only a small selection of logical papers. It was not before the beginning of the 20th century that the majority of his logical fragments became generally accessible by the valuable edition of Louis Couturat.

Since only few manuscripts were dated by Leibniz, his logical oeuvre shall not be described here in chronological order but from a merely systematic point of view by distinguishing four groups:

  1. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism
  2. Works on the Universal Calculus
  3. Works on Propositional Logic
  4. Works on Modal Logic.

2. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism

Leibniz’s innovations within the theory of the syllogism comprise at least three topics:

(a)   An "Axiomatization" of the theory of the syllogism, that is, a reduction of the traditional inferences to a small number of basic laws which are sufficient to derive all other syllogisms.

(b)   The development of the semantics of so-called "characteristic num­bers" for evaluating the logical validity of a syllogistic inference.

(c)    The invention of two sorts of graphical devices, that is to say, linear diagrams and (later) so-called "Euler-circles," as a heuristic for checking the validity of a syllogism.

a. Axiomatization of the Theory of the Syllogism

In the 17th century, logic was still strongly influenced, if not dominated, by syllogistic, that is, by the traditional theory of the four categorical forms:

Universal affirmative proposition (UA)        Every S is P          SaP

Universal negative proposition (UN)              No S is P               SeP

Particular affirmative proposition (PA)         Some S is P          SiP

Particular negative proposition (PN)              Some S isn’t P      SoP

A typical textbook of that time is the famous “Logique de Port Royal” (Arnauld & Nicole (1683)) which, apart from an introductory investigation of ideas, concepts, and propositions in general, basically consists of:

(i)       The theory of the so-called “simple” laws of subalternation, oppo­sition, and conversion;

(ii)      The theory of the syllogistic “moods” which are classified into four different “figures” for which specific rules hold.

As Leibniz defines it, a “subalternation takes place whenever a particular proposition is inferred from the corresponding universal proposition” (Cout, 80), that is:

SUB 1            SaP → SiP

SUB 2            SeP → SoP.

According to the modern analysis of the categorical forms in terms of first order logic, these laws are not strictly valid but hold only under the assumption that the subject term S is not empty. This problem of "existential import" will be discussed below.

The theory of opposition first has to determine which propositions are contradictories of each other in the sense that they can neither be together true nor be together false. Clearly, the PN is the contradictory, or negation, of the UA, while the PA is the negation of the UN:

OPP 1            ¬SaP ↔ SoP

OPP 2            ¬SeP ↔ SiP.

The next task is to determine which propositions are contraries to each other in the sense that they cannot be together true, while they may well be together false. As Leibniz states in “Theorem 6: The universal affirmative and the universal negative are contrary to each other” (Cout, 82). Finally, two propositions are said to be subcontraries if they cannot be together false while it is possible that are together true. As Leibniz notes in another theorem, the two particular propositions, SiP and SoP, are logically related to each other in this way. The theory of subalternation and opposition is often summarized in the familiar “Square of Opposition”:


In the paper “De formis syllogismorum Mathematice definiendis” written around 1682 (Cout, 410-416, and the text-critical edition in AE VI, 4, 496-505) Leibniz tackled the task of "axiomatizing" the theory of the syllogistic figures and moods by reducing them to a small number of basic principles. The “Fundamentum syllogisticum”, that is, the axiomatic basis of the theory of the syllogism, is the “Dictum de omni et nullo” (The saying of ‘all’ and ‘none’):

If a total C falls within another total D, or if the total C falls outside D, then whatever is in C, also falls within D (in the former case) or outside D (in the latter case) (Cout, 410-411).

These laws warrant the validity of the following "perfect" moods of the “First Figure”:

BARBARA        CaD, BaC → BaD

CELARENT      CeD, BaC → BeD

DARII                 CaD, BiC → BiD

FERIO                 CeD, BiC → BoD.

On the one hand, if the second premise of the affirmative moods BARBARA and DARII is satisfied, that is, if B is either totally or partially contained in D, then, according to the “Dictum de Omni”, also B must be either totally or partially contained in D since, by the first premise, C is entirely contained in D. Similarly the negative moods CELARENT and FERIO follow from the “Dictum de Nullo”: “B is either totally or partially contained in C; but the entire C falls outside D; hence also B either totally or partially falls outside D” (Cout, 411).

Next Leibniz derives the laws of subalternation from the syllogisms DARII and FERIO by substituting ‘B’ for ‘C’ and ‘C’ for ‘D’, respectively. This derivation (and hence also the validity of the laws of subalternation) tacitly presupposes the following principle which Leibniz considered as an “identity”:

SOME             BiB.

With the help of the laws of subalternation, BARBARA and CELARENT may be "weakened" into

BARBARI      CaD, BaC → BiD

CELARO        CeD, BaC → BoD.

Thus the First Figure altogether has six valid moods, from which one obtains six moods of the Second and six of the Third Figure by means of a logical inference-scheme called “Regressus”:

REGRESS      If a conclusion Q logically follows from premises P1, P2, but if Q is false, then one of the premises must be false.

When Leibniz carefully carries out these derivations, he presupposes the laws of opposition, Opp 1, Opp 2. Finally, six valid moods of the Fourth Figure can be derived from corresponding moods of the First Figure with the help of the laws of conversions.According to traditional doctrines, the PA and the UN may be converted “simpliciter”, while the UA can only be converted “per accidens”:

CONV 1          BiD → DiB

CONV 2          BeD → DeB

CONV 3          BaD → DiB.

As Leibniz shows, these laws can in turn be derived from some previously proven syllogisms with the help of the "identical" proposition:

ALL                BaB.

Furthermore one easily obtains another law of conversion according to which the UN can also be converted "accidentally":

CONV 4          BeD → DoB.

The announced derivation of the moods of the Fourth Figure was not carried out in the fragment “De formis syllogismorum Mathematice definiendis” which just breaks off with a reference to “Figura Quarta”. It may, however, be found in the manuscript LH IV, 6, 14, 3 which, unfortunately, was only partially edited in Cout, 204. At any rate, Leibniz managed to prove that all valid moods can be reduced to the “Fundamentum syllogisticum” in conjunction with the laws of opposition, the inference scheme “Regressus”, and the "identical" propositions SOME and ALL.

Now while ALL is an identity or theorem of first order logic, ∀x(Bx → Bx), SOME is nowadays interpreted as ∃x(Bx ∧ Bx). This formula is equivalent to ∃x(Bx), that is, to the assumption that there "exists" at least one x such that x is B. Hence the laws of subalternation presuppose that each concept B (which can occupy the position of the subject of a categorical form) is "non-empty". Leibniz discussed this problem of "existential import" in a paper entitled “Difficultates quaedam logicae” (GP 7, 211-217) where he distinguished two kinds of "existence": Actual existence of the individuals inhabiting our real world vs. merely possible subsistence of individuals “in the region of ideas”. According to Leibniz, logical inferences should always be evaluated with reference to “the region of ideas”, that is, the larger set of all possible individuals. Therefore all that is required for the validity of subalternation is that the term B occupying the position of the subject of a categorical form has a non-empty extension within the domain of possible individuals. As will turn out below (compare the definition of an extensional interpretation of L1 in section 3.1), this weak condition of "existential import" becomes tantamount to the assumption that the respective concept B is self-consistent!

b. The Semantics of “Characteristic Numbers”

In a series of papers of April 1679, Leibniz elaborated the idea of assigning natural numbers to the subject and predicate of a proposition a in such a way that the truth of a can be "read off" from these numbers. Apparently Leibniz was hoping that mankind might once discover the "true" characteristic numbers which would enable one to determine the truth of arbitrary propositions just by mathematical calculations! In the essays of April 1679, however, he pursued only the much more modest goal of defining appropriate arithmetical conditions for determining whether a syllogistic inference is logically valid. This task was guided by the idea that a term composed of concepts A and B gets assigned the product of the numbers assigned to the components:

For example, since ‘man’ is ‘rational animal’, if the number of ‘animal’, a, is 2, and the number of ‘rational’, r, is 3, then the number of ‘man’, m, will be the same as a*r, in this example 2*3 or 6. (LLP, 17).

Now a UA like ‘All gold is metal’ can be understood as maintaining that the concept ‘gold’ contains the concept ‘metal’ (because ‘gold’ can be defined as ‘the heaviest metal’). Therefore it seems obvious to postulate that in general ‘Every S is P’ is true if and only if s, the characteristic number assigned to S, contains p, the number assigned to P, as a prime factor; or, in other words, s must be divisible by p. In a first approach, Leibniz thought that the truth-conditions for the particular proposition ‘Some S are P’ might be construed similarly by requiring that either s can be divided by p or conversely p can be divided by s. But this was mistaken. After some trials and errors, Leibniz found the following more complicated solution:

(i)     To every term T, a pair of natural numbers <+t1;-t2> is assigned such that t1 and t2 are relatively prime, that is, they don’t have a common divisor.

(ii)    The UA ‘Every S is P’ is true (relative to the assignment (i)) if and only if +s1 is divisible by +p1 and -s2 is divisible by -p2.

(iii)   The UN ‘No S is P’ is true if and only if +s1 and -p2 have a common divisor or +p1 and -s2 have a common divisor.

(iv)   The PA ‘Some S is P’ is true if and only if condition (iii) is not satisfied.

(v)    The PN ‘Some S isn’t P’ is true if and only if condition (ii) is not satisfied.

(vi)   An inference from premises P1, P2 to the conclusion C is logically valid if and only if for each assignment of numbers satisfying condition (i), C becomes true whenever both P1 and P2 are true.

As was shown by Lukasiewicz (1951), this semantics satisfies the simple inferences of opposition, subalternation, and conversion, as well as all (and only) the syllogisms which are commonly regarded as valid. Leibniz tried to generalize this semantics for the entire algebra of concepts, but he never found a way to cope with negative concepts. This problem has only been solved by contemporary logicians; compare Sanchez-Mazas (1979), Sotirov (1999).

c. Linear Diagrams and Euler-circles

In the paper “De Formae Logicae Comprobatione per Linearum ductus” probably written after 1686 (Cout, 292-321), Leibniz elaborated two methods for representing the content of categorical propositions. The UA, for example, ‘Every man is an animal’, can be represented either by two nested circles or by two horizontal lines which symbolize that the extension of B is contained in the extension of C (the subsequent graphics are scans from Cout, 292-295):


In the case of a UN like ‘No man is a stone’, one obtains the following diagrams which symbolize that the extension of B is set-theoretically disjoint from the extension of C:


Similarly, the following circles and lines symbolize that, in the case of a PA like ‘Some men are wise’, the extensions of B and C overlap:


Finally, in the case of a PN like ‘Some men are not ruffians’, the diagrams are meant to symbolize that the extension of B is partially disjoint from the extension of C,that is, that some elements of B are not elements of C:


These diagrams may then be used to check whether a given inference is valid. Thus, for example, the validity of FERIO can be illustrated as follows:


Here the conclusion ‘Some D is not B’ follows from the premises ‘No C is B’ and ‘Some D is C’ because the elements of D which are in C can’t be elements of B. On the other hand, invalid syllogisms as, for example, the mood “AOO” of the Fourth Figure, can be refuted as follows:


As the diagram illustrates, the truth of the premises ‘Every B is C’ and ‘Some C is not D’ is compatible with a situation where the conclusion ‘Some D is not B’ is false, that is, where ‘Every D is B’ is true.

Of course, Leibniz’s diagrams which were re-discovered in the 18th century among others by Euler (1768) are not without problems. In particular, the circles for the PA and the PN are somewhat inaccurate because they basic­ally visualize one and the same state of affairs, namely that (i) some B are C, and (ii) some B are not C, and also (iii) some C are not B. The need to distinguish between different situations such as ((i) & (ii)) in contrast to ((i) & not (ii)) led to improvements of the method of "Euler-circles" as suggested by Venn (1881), Hamilton (1861), and others. Note, incidentally, that, in the GI, Leibniz himself improved the linear diagrams for the UA, PA and PN by drawing perpendicular lines symbolizing the “maximum”,that is, “the limits beyond which the terms cannot, and within which they can, be extended”. At the same time he used a double horizontal line to symbolize “the minimum, that is, that which cannot be taken away without affecting the relation of the terms” (LLP, 73-4, fn. 2).

3. Works on the Universal Calculus

In the period between, roughly, 1679 and 1690, Leibniz spent much effort to generalize the traditional logic to a “Universal Calculus”. At least three different calculi may be distinguished:

(a) The algebra of concepts which is provably equivalent to the Boolean algebra of sets;

(b)   A fragmentary quantificational system in which the quantifiers range over concepts but in which quantification over individuals may be introduced by definition;

(c) The so-called "Plus-Minus-calculus" which constitutes an abstract system of "real addition" and "subtraction". When this calculus is applied to concepts, it yields a weaker logic than the full algebra (a).

a. The Algebra of Concepts L1

The algebra of concepts grows out of the syllogistic framework by three achievements. First, Leibniz drops the informal quantifier expression ‘every’ and formulates the UA simply as “A is B” or, equivalently, as “A contains B”. This fundamental proposition shall here be symbolized as A∈B while its negation will be abbreviated as A∉B. Second, Leibniz introduces an operator of conceptual conjunction which combines two concepts A and B into AB (sometimes also written as “A+B”). Third, Leibniz allows the unrestricted use of conceptual negation which shall here be symbolized as ~A (“Not-A”). Hence, in particular, one can form the inconsistent concept A~A (“A Not-A”) and its tautological counterpart ~(A~A).

Identity or coincidence of concepts might be defined as mutual containment:

DEF 1            (A = B) =df (A∈B) ∧ (B∈A).

Alternatively, the algebra of concepts can be built up with ‘=’ as a primitive operator while ‘∈’ is defined by:

DEF 2            (A∈B) =df (A = AB).

Another important operator may be introduced by definition. Concept B is possible if B does not contain a contradiction like A~A:

DEF 3            P(B) =df (B∉A~A).

Leibniz uses many different locutions to express the self-consistency of a concept A. Instead of ‘A est possibile’ he often says ‘A est res’, ‘A est ens’; or simply ‘A est’. In the opposite case of an impossible concept he also calls A a "false term" (“terminus falsus”).

Identity can be axiomatized by the law of reflexivity in conjunction with the rule of substitutivity:

IDEN 1            A = A

IDEN 2            If A = B, then α[A] ↔ α[B].

By means of these principles, one easily derives the following corollaries:

IDEN 3            A = B → B = A

IDEN 4            A = B ∧ B = C → A = C

IDEN 5            A = B → ~A = ~B

IDEN 6            A = B → AC = BC.

The following laws express the reflexivity and the transitivity of the containment relation:

CONT 1          A∈A

CONT 2          A∈B ∧ B∈C → A∈C.

The most fundamental principle for the operator of conceptual conjunction says: “That A contains B and A contains C is the same as that A contains BC” (LLP, 58, fn. 4), that is,

CONJ 1          A∈BC ↔ A∈B ∧ A∈C.

Conjunction then satisfies the following laws:

CONJ 2          AA = A

CONJ 3          AB = BA

CONJ 4          AB∈A

CONJ 5          AB∈B.

The next operator is conceptual negation, ‘not’. Leibniz had serious problems with finding the proper laws governing this operator. From the tradition, he knew little more than the “law of double negation”:

CONJ 1            ~~A = A

One important step towards a complete theory of conceptual negation was to transform the informal principle of contraposition, ‘Every A is B, therefore Every Not-B is Not-A’ into the following principle:

NEG 2            A∈B ↔ ~B∈~A.

Furthermore Leibniz discovered various variants of the “law of consistency”:

NEG 3            A ≠ ~A

NEG 4            A = B → A ≠ ~B.

NEG 5*           A∉~A

NEG 6*           A∈B → A∉~B.

In the GI, these principles are formulated as follows: “A proposition false in itself is ‘A coincides with Not-A’” (§ 11); “If A = B, then A ≠ Not-B” (§ 171); “It is false that B contains Not-B, that is, B doesn’t contain Not-B” (§ 43); and “A is B, therefore A isn’t Not-B” (§ 91).

Principles NEG 5* and NEG 6* have been marked with a ‘*’ in order to indicate that the laws as stated by Leibniz are not absolutely valid but have to be restricted to self-consistent terms:

NEG 5            P(A) → A∉~A

NEG 6            P(A) → (A∈B → A∉~B).

The following two laws describe some characteristic relations between the possibility-operator P and the other operators of L1:

POSS 1           A∈B ∧ P(A) → P(B)

POSS 2           A∈B ↔ ¬P(A~B).

All these principles have been discovered by Leibniz himself who thus provided an almost complete axiomatization of L1. As a matter of fact, the "intensional" algebra of concept can be proven to be equivalent to Boole’s extensional algebra of sets provided that one adds the following counterpart of the “ex contradictorio quodlibet”:

NEG 7            (A~A)∈B.

As regards the relation of conceptual containment, A∈B, it is important to observe that Leibniz’s standard formulation ‘A contains B’ expresses the so-called "intensional" view of concepts as ideas, while we here want to develop an extensional interpretation in terms of the sets of individuals that fall under the concepts. Leibniz explained the mutual relationship between the "intensional" and the extensional point of view in the following passage from the “New Essays on Human understanding”:

The common manner of statement concerns individuals, whereas Aristotle’s refers rather to ideas or universals. For when I say Every man is an animal I mean that all the men are included among all the animals; but at the same time I mean that the idea of animal is included in the idea of man. ‘Animal’ comprises more individuals than ‘man’ does, but ‘man’ comprises more ideas or more attributes: one has more instances, the other more degrees of reality; one has the greater extension, the other the greater intension. (NE, Book IV, ch. XVII, § 8; compare the original French version in GP 5, 469).

If 'Int(A)’ and 'Ext(A)’ abbreviate the "intension" and the extension of a concept A, respectively, then the so-called law of reciprocity can be formalized as follows:

RECI               Int(A) ⊆ Int (B) ↔ Ext(A) ⊇ Ext(B).

From this it immediately follows that two concepts A, B have the same "intension" iff they have the same extension. This somewhat surprising result might seem to unveil an inadequacy of Leibniz’s conception. However, "intensionality" in the sense of traditional logic must not be mixed up with intensionality in the modern sense. Furthermore, in Leibniz’s view, the extension of a concept A is not just the set of actually existing individuals, but rather the set of all possible individuals that fall under concept A. Therefore one may define the concept of an extensional interpretation of L1 in accordance with Leibniz’s ideas as follows:

DEF 4      Let U be a non-empty set (the domain of all possible indi­viduals), and let ϕ be a function such that ϕ(A) ⊆ U for each concept-letter A. Then ϕ is an extensional interpretation of L1 if and only if:

(1) ϕ(A∈B) = true iff ϕ(A) ⊆ ϕ(B);

(2) ϕ(A=B) = true iff ϕ(A) = ϕ(B);

(3) ϕ(AB) = ϕ(A) ∩ ϕ(B);

(4) ϕ(~A) = complement of ϕ(A);

(5) ϕ(P(A)) = true iff ϕ(A) ≠ ∅.

Conditions (1) and (2) are straightforward consequences of RECI. Condition (3) also is trivial since it expresses that an individual x belongs to the extension of AB just in case that x belongs to the extension of both concepts (and hence to their intersection). According to condition (4), the extension of the negative concept ~A is just the set of all individuals which do not fall under the concept A. Condition (5) says that a concept A is possible if and only if it has a non-empty extension.

At first sight, this requirement appears inadequate, since there are certain concepts – such as that of a unicorn – which happen to be empty but which may nevertheless be regarded as possible, that is, not involving a contradiction. However, the universe of discourse underlying the extensional interpretation of L1 does not consist of actually existing objects only, but instead comprises all possible individuals. Therefore the non-emptiness of the extension of A is both necessary and sufficient for guaranteeing the self-consistency of A. Clearly, if A is possible, then there must be at least one possible individual x that falls under concept A.

It has often been noted that Leibniz’s logic of concepts lacks the operator of disjunction. Although this is by and large correct, it doesn’t imply any defect or any incompleteness of the system L1 because the operator A∨B may simply be introduced by definition:

DISJ 1            A∨B =df ~(~A ~B).

On the background of the above axioms of negation and conjunction, the standard laws for disjunction, for example

DISJ 2            A∈(A∨B)

DISJ 3            B∈(A∨B)

DISJ 4            A∈C ∧ B∈C → (A∨B)∈C,

then become provable (Lenzen (1984)).

b. The Quantificational System L2

Leibniz’s quantifier logic L2 emerges from L1 by the introduction of so-called “indefinite concepts”. These concepts are symbolized by letters from the end of the alphabet X, Y, Z ..., and they function as quantifiers ranging over concepts. Thus, in the GI, Leibniz explains:

(16) An affirmative proposition is ‘A is B’ or ‘A contains B’ [...]. That is, if we substitute the value for A, one obtains ‘A coincides with BY’. For example, ‘Man is an animal’, that is, ‘Man’ is the same as ‘a ... animal’ (namely, ‘Man’ is ‘rational animal’). For by the sign ‘Y’ I mean something undetermined, so that ‘BY’ is the same as ‘Some B’, or ‘A ... animal’ [...], or ‘A certain animal’. So ‘A is B’ is the same as ‘A coincides with some B’, that is, ‘A = BY’.

With the help of the modern symbol for the existential quantifier, the latter law can be expressed more precisely as follows:

CONT 3          A∈B ↔ ∃Y(A = BY).

As Leibniz himself noted, the formalization of the UA according to CONT 3 is provably equivalent to the simpler representation according to DEF 2:

It is noteworthy that for ‘A = BY’ one can also say ‘A = AB’ so that there is no need to introduce a new letter. (Cout, 366; compare also LLP, 56, fn. 1.)

On the one hand, according to the rule of existential generalization,

EXIST 1          If α[A], then ∃Yα[Y],

A = AB immediately entails ∃Y(A = YB). On the other hand, if there exists some Y such that A = YB, then according to IDEN 6, AB = YBB, that is, AB = YB and hence (by the premise A = YB) AB = A. (This proof incidentally was given by Leibniz himself in the important paper “Primaria Calculi Logic Fundamenta” of August 1690; Cout, 235).

Next observe that Leibniz often used to formalize the PA ‘Some A is B’ by means of the indefinite concept Y as ‘YA∈B’. In view of CONT 3, this repre­sentation might be transformed into the (elliptic) equation YA = ZB. However, both formalizations are somewhat inadequate because they are easily seen to be theorems of L2! According to CONJ 4, BA contains B, hence by EXIST 1:

CONJ 6          ∃Y(YA∈B).

Similarly, since, according to CONJ 3, AB = BA, a twofold application of EXIST 1 yields:

CONJ 7          ∃Y∃Z(YA = BZ).

These tautologies, of course, cannot adequately represent the PA which for an appropriate choice of concepts A and B may become false! In order to resolve these difficulties, consider a draft of a calculus probably written between 1686 and 1690 (compare Cout, 259-261, and the text-critical edition in AE, VI, 4, # 171), where Leibniz proved principle:

NEG 8*           A∉B ↔ ∃Y(YA∈~B).

On the one hand, it is interesting to see that after first formulating the right hand side of the equivalence, "as usual", in the elliptic way ‘YA is Not-B’, Leibniz later paraphrased it by means of the explicit quantifier expression “there exists a Y such that YA is Not-B”. On the other hand, Leibniz discovered that NEG 8* has to be improved by requiring more exactly that there exists a Y such that YA contains ~B and YA is possible, that is, Y must be compatible with A:

NEG 8            A∉B ↔ ∃Y(P(YA) ∧ YA∈~B).

Leibniz’s proof of this important law is quite remarkable:

(18) […] to say ‘A isn’t B’ is the same as to say ‘there exists a Y such that YA is Not-B’. If ‘A is B’ is false, then ‘A Not-B’ is possible by [POSS 2]. ‘Not-B’ shall be called ‘Y’. Hence YA is possible. Hence YA is Not-B. Therefore we have shown that, if it is false that A is B, then QA is Not-B. Conversely, let us show that if QA is Not-B, ‘A is B’ is false. For if ‘A is B’ would be true, ‘B’ could be substituted for ‘A’ and we would obtain ‘QB is Not-B’ which is absurd. (Cout, 261)

To conclude the sketch of L2, let us consider some of the rare passages where an indefinite concept functions as a universal quantifier. In the above quoted draft (Cout, 260), Leibniz put forward principle “(15) ‘A is B’ is the same as ‘If L is A, it follows that L is B’”:

CONT 4          A∈B ↔ ∀Y(Y∈A → Y∈B).

Furthermore, in § 32 GI, Leibniz at least vaguely recognized that just as A∈B (according to CONJ 6) is equivalent to ∃Y(A = YB), so the negation A∉B means that, for any indefinite concept Y, A ≠ BY:

CONT 5          A∉B ↔ ∀Y(A ≠ YB).

According to AE, VI, 4, 753, Leibniz had written: “(32) Propositio Negativa. A non continet B, seu A esse (continere) B falsum est, seu A non coincidit BY”. Unfortunately, the last passage ‘seu A non coincidit BY’ had been overlooked by Couturat and it is therefore also missing in Parkinson’s translation in LLP! Anyway, with the help of ‘∀’, one can formalize Leibniz’s conception of individual concepts as maximally-consistent concepts as follows:

IND 1             Ind(A) ↔df P(A) ∧ ∀Y(P(AY) → A∈Y).

Thus A is an individual concept iff A is "self-consistent and A contains every concept Y which is compatible with A. The underlying idea of the complete­ness of individual concepts had been formulated in § 72 GI as follows:

So if BY is ["being"], and the indefinite term Y is superfluous, that is, in the way that ‘a certain Alexander the Great’ and ‘Alexander the Great’ are the same, then B is an individual. If the term BA is ["being"] and if B is an individual, then A will be superfluous; or if BA=C, then B=C (LLP 65, § 72 + fn. 1; for a closer interpretation of this idea, see Lenzen (2004c)).

Note, incidentally, that IND 1 might be simplified by requiring that, for each concept Y, A either contains Y or contains ~Y:

IND 2             Ind(A) ↔ ∀Y(A∈~Y ↔ A∉Y).

As a corollary it follows that the invalid principle

NEG 9*          A∉B → A∈~B,

which Leibniz again and again had considered as valid, in fact holds only for individual concepts:

NEG 9            Ind(A) → (A∉B → A∈~B).

Already in the “Calculi Universalis Investigationes” of 1679, Leibniz had pointed out:

…If two propositions are given with exactly the same singular [!] subject, where the predicate of the one is contradictory to the predicate of the other, then necessarily one proposition is true and the other is false. But I say: exactly the same [singular] subject, for example, ‘This gold is a metal’, ‘This gold is a not-metal.’ (AE VI, 4, 217-218).

The crucial issue here is that NEG 9* holds only for an individual concept like, for example, ‘Apostle Peter’, but not for general concepts as, for example, ‘man’. The text-critical apparatus of AE reveals that Leibniz was somewhat diffident about this decisive point. He began to illustrate the above rule by the correct example “if I say ‘Apostle Peter was a Roman bishop’, and ‘Apostle Peter was not a Roman bishop’” and then went on, erroneously, to generalize this law for arbitrary terms: “or if I say ‘Every man is learned’ ‘Every man is not learned’.” Finally he noticed this error “Here it becomes evident that I am mistaken, for this rule is not valid.” The long story of Leibniz’s cardinal mistake of mixing up ‘A isn’t B’ and ‘A is not-B’ is analyzed in detail in Lenzen (1986).

There are many different ways to represent the categorical forms by formulas of L1 or L2. The most straightforward formalization would be the following "homogenous" schema in terms of conceptual containment:

UA   A∈B                                    UN   A∈~B

PA   A∉~B                                  PN   A∉B.

The "homogeneity" consists in two facts:

(a)   The formula for the UN is obtained from that of the UA by replacing the predicate B with its negation, ~B. This is the formal counterpart of the traditional principle of obversion according to which, for example, ‘No A is B’ is equivalent to ‘Every A is not-B’.

(b)  In accordance with the traditional laws of opposition, the formulas for the particular propositions are just taken as the negations of corresponding universal propositions.

In view of DEF 2, the first schema may be transformed into

UA   A = AB                                UN   A = A~B

PA   A ≠ A~B                               PN   A ≠ AB.

Similarly, by means of the fundamental law POSS 2, one obtains

UA   ¬P(A~B)                              UN   ¬P(AB)

PA   P(AB)                                   PN   P(A~B).

Furthermore, with the help of indefinite concepts, one can formulate, for example,

UA   ∃Y(A = YB)                          UN   ∃Y(A = Y~B)

PA   ∀Y(A ≠ Y~B)                        PN   ∀Y(A ≠ YB).

Leibniz used to work with various elements of these representations, often combining them into complicated inhomogeneous schemata such as:

“A = YB           is the UA, where the adjunct Y is like an additional unknown term: ‘Every man’ is the same as ‘A certain animal’.

YA = ZB           is the PA. ‘Some man’ or ‘Man of a certain kind’ is the same as ‘A certain learned’.

A = Y not-B      [is the UN] No man is a stone, that is, Every man is a not-stone, that is, ‘Man’ and ‘A certain not-stone’ coincide.

YA = Z not-B    [is the PN] A certain man isn’t learned or is not-learned, that is, ‘A certain man’ and ‘A certain not-learned’ coincide” (Cout, 233-234).

But the representations of PA and PN of this schema are inadequate because the formulas ‘[∃Y∃Z](YA = ZB)’ and ‘[∃Y∃Z](YA = Z~B)’ are theorems of L2! These conditions may, however, easily be corrected by adding the require­ment that YA is self-consistent:

UA   ∃Y(A = YB)                                  UN   ∃Y(A = Y~B)

PA   ∃Y∃Z(P(YA) ∧ YA = ZB)        PN   ∃Y∃Z(P(YA) ∧ YA = Z~B).

Already in the paper “De Formae Logicae Comprobatione per Linearum ductus”, Leibniz had made numerous attempts to prove the basic laws of syllogistic with the help of these schemata. He continued these efforts in two interesting fragments of August 1690 dealing with “The Primary Bases of a Logical Calculus” (LLP, 90 – 92 + 93-94; compare also the closely related essays “Principia Calculi rationalis” in Cout, 229-231 and the untitled fragments Cout, 259-261 + 261-264). In the end, however, Leibniz remained unsatisfied with his attempts.

To be sure, a complete proof of the theory of the syllogism could easily be obtained by drawing upon the full list of "axioms" for L1 and L2 as stated above. But Leibniz more ambitiously tried to find proofs which presuppose only a small number of "self-evident" laws for identity. In particular, he was not willing to adopt principle

(17) Not-B = not-B not-(AB), that is, Not-B contains Not-AB, or Not-B is not-AB

as a fundamental axiom which therefore needs not itself be demonstrated. Although Leibniz realized that (17) is equivalent to the law of contraposition repeated in the subsequent §

(19) ‘A = AB’ and ‘Not-B = Not-B Not-A’ are equivalent. This is conversion by contraposition (Cout, 422),

he still thought it necessary to prove this "axiom": “This remains to be demonstrated in our calculus”!

c. The Plus-Minus-Calculus

The so-called Plus-Minus-Calculus was mainly developed in the paper “Non inelegans specimen demonstrandi in abstractis” of around 1686/7 (compare GP 7, ## XIX, XX and the text-critical edition in AE VI, 4, ## 177, 178; English translations are provided in LLP, 122-130 + 131-144). Strictly speaking, the Plus-Minus-Calculus is not a logical calculus but rather a much more general calculus which admits of different applications and interpretations. In its abstract form, it should be regarded as a theory of set-theoretical containment, set-theoretical "addition", and set-theoretical "subtraction". Unlike modern systems of set-theory, however, Leibniz’s calculus has no counterpart of the relation ‘x is an element of A’; and it also lacks the operator of set-theoretical "negation", that is, set-theoretical complement! The complement of set A might, though, be defined with the help of the subtraction operator as (U-A) where the constant ‘U’ designates the universe of discourse. But, in Leibniz’s calculus, this additional logical element is lacking.

Leibniz’s drafts exhibit certain inconsistencies which result from the experi­mental character of developing the laws for "real" addition and subtraction in close analogy to the laws of arithmetical addition and subtraction. The genesis of this idea is described in detail in Lenzen (1989). The incon­sistencies might be removed basically in two ways. First, one might restrict A-B to the case where B is contained in A; such a conservative reconstruction of the Plus-Minus-Calculus has been developed in Dürr (1930). The second, more rewarding alternative consists in admitting the operation of "real subtraction" A-B also if B is not contained in A. In any case, however, one has to give up Leibniz’s idea that subtraction might yield "privative" entities which are "less than nothing".

In the following reconstruction, Leibniz’s symbols ‘+’ for the addition (that is, union) and ‘-’ for the subtraction of sets are adopted, while his informal expressions ‘Nothing’ (“nihil”) and ‘is in’ (“est in”) are replaced by the modern symbols ‘∅’ and ‘⊆’. Set-theoretical identity may be treated either as a primitive or as a defined operator. In the former case, inclusion can be defined either by A⊆B =df ∃Y(A+Y = B) or simpler as A⊆B =df (A+B = B). If, conversely, inclusion is taken as primitive, identity can be defined as mutual inclusion: A=B =df (A⊆B) ∧ (B⊆A) (see, for example, Definition 3, Propositions 13 +14 and Proposition 17 in LLP, 131-144).

Set-theoretical addition is symmetric, or, as Leibniz puts it, “transposition makes no difference here” (LLP, 132):

PLUS 1           A+B = B+A.

The main difference between arithmetical addition and "real addition" is that the addition of one and the same "real" thing (or set of things) doesn’t yield anything new:

PLUS 2           A+A = A.

As Leibniz puts it (LLP, 132): “A+A = A […] that is, repetition changes nothing. (For although four coins and another four coins are eight coins, four coins and the same four already counted are not)”.

The "real nothing", that is, the empty set ∅, is characterized as follows: “It does not matter whether Nothing is put or not, that is, A+Nih. = A” (Cout, 267):

NIHIL 1           A+∅ = A.

In view of the relation (A⊆B) ↔ (A+B = B), this law can be transformed into:

NIHIL 2           ∅⊆A.

"Real" subtraction may be regarded as the converse operation of addition: “If the same is put and taken away [...] it coincides with Nothing. That is, A [...] - A [...] = N” (LLP, 124, Axiom 2):

MINUS 1         A-A = ∅.

Leibniz also considered the following principles which in a stronger form express that negation is the converse of addition:

MINUS 2*       (A+B)-B = A

MINUS 3*       (A+B) = C → C-B = A.

But he soon recognized that these laws do not hold in general but only in the special case where the sets A and B are “uncommunicating” (Cout, 267, # 29: “Therefore if A+B = C, then A = C-B […] but it is necessary that A and B have nothing in common”.) The new operator of “communicating” sets has to be understood as follows:

If some term, M, is in A, and the same term is in B, this term is said to be ‘common’ to them, and they will be said to be ‘communicating’. (LLP, 123, Definition 4)

Hence two sets A and B have something in common if and only if there exists some set Y such that Y⊆A and Y⊆B. Now since, trivially, the empty set is included in every set A (NIHIL 2), one has to add the qualification that Y is not empty:

COMMON 1     Com(A,B) ↔df ∃Y(Y≠∅ ∧ Y⊆A ∧ Y⊆B).

The necessary restriction of MINUS 2* and MINUS 3* can then be formalized as follows:

MINUS 2         ¬Com(A,B) → ((A+B)-B = A)

MINUS 3         ¬Com(A,B) ∧ (A+B = C) → (C-B = A).

Similarly, Leibniz recognized (LLP, 130) that from an equation A+B = A+C, A may be subtracted on both sides provided that C is “uncommunicating” both with A and with B, that is,

MINUS 4         ¬Com(A,B) ∧ ¬Com(A,C) → (A+B = A+C → B=C).

Furthermore Leibniz discovered that the implication in MINUS 2 may be converted (and hence strengthened into a biconditional). Thus one obtains the following criterion: Two sets A, B are “uncommunicating” if and only if the result of first adding and then subtracting B coincides with A. Inserting negations on both sides of this equivalence one obtains:

COMMON 2     Com(A,B) ↔ ((A+B)-B) ≠ A.

Whenever two sets A, B are communicating or “have something in common”, the intersection of A and B, in modern symbols A∩B, is not empty (LLP, 127, Case 2 of Theorem IX: “Let us assume meanwhile that E is everything which A and G have in common – if they have something in common, so that if they have nothing in common, E = Nothing”), that is,

COMMON 3     Com(A,B) ↔ A∩B ≠ ∅.

Furthermore, “What has been subtracted and the remainder are un­communicating” (LLP, 128, Theorem X), that is,

COMMON 4     ¬Com(A-B,B).

Leibniz further discovered the following formula which allows one to "calculate" the intersection or “commune” of A and B by a series of additions and subtractions: A∩B = B-((A+B)-A). In a small fragment (Cout, 250) he explained:

Suppose you have A and B and you want to know if there exists some M which is in both of them. Solution: combine those two into one, A+B, which shall be called L […] and from L one of the constituents, A, shall be subtracted […] let the rest be N; then, if N coincides with the other constituent, B, they have nothing in common. But if they do not coincide, they have something in common which can be found by subtracting the rest N [...] from B […] and there remains M, the commune of A and B, which was looked for.

4. Leibniz’s Calculus of Strict Implication

It is a characteristic feature of Leibniz’s logic that when he states and proves the laws of concept logic, he takes the requisite rules and laws of propositional logic for granted. Once the former have been established, however, the latter can be obtained from the former by observing a strict analogy between concepts and propositions which allows one to re-interpret the conceptual connectives as propositional connectives. Note, incidentally, that in the 19th century George Boole in roughly the same way first presupposed propositional logic to develop his algebra of sets, and only afterwards derived the propositional calculus out of the set-theoretical calculus. While Boole thus arrived at the classical, two-valued propositional calculus, Leibniz’s approach instead yields a modal logic of strict implication.

Leibniz outlined a simple, ingenious method to transform the algebra of concepts into an algebra of propositions. Already in the “Notationes Generales” written between 1683 and 1685 (AE VI, 4, # 131), he pointed out to the parallel between the containment relation among concepts and the implication relation among propositions. Just as the simple proposition ‘A is B’ is true, “when the predicate [A] is contained in the subject” B, so a conditional proposition ‘If A is B, then C is D’ is true, “when the consequent is contained in the antecedent” (AE VI, 4, 551). In later works Leibniz compressed this idea into formulations such as “a proposition is true whose predicate is contained in the subject or more generally whose consequent is contained in the antecedent” (Cout, 401). The most detailed explanation of this idea was given in §§ 75, 137 and 189 of the GI:

If, as I hope, I can conceive all propositions as terms, and hypotheticals as categoricals and if I can treat all propositions universally, this promises a wonderful ease in my symbolism and analysis of concepts, and will be a discovery of the greatest importance […]

We have, then, discovered many secrets of great importance for the analysis of all our thoughts and for the discovery and proof of truths. We have discovered [...] how absolute and hypothetical truths have one and the same laws and are contained in the same general theorems […]

Our principles, therefore, will be these [...] Sixth, whatever is said of a term which contains a term can also be said of a proposition from which another proposition follows (LLP, 66, 78, and 85).

To conceive all propositions in analogy to concepts means in particular that the conditional ‘If a then b’ will be logically treated like the containment relation between concepts, ‘A contains B’. Furthermore, as Leibniz explained elsewhere, negations and conjunctions of propositions are to be conceived just as negations and conjunctions of concepts. Thus one obtains the following mapping of the primitive formulas of the algebra of concepts into formulas of the algebra of propositions:

A∈B              α → β

A=B               α ↔ β

~A                 ¬α

AB                 α∧β

P(A)              ◊α

As Leibniz himself explained, the fundamental law POSS 2 does not only hold for the containment-relation between concepts but also for the entailment relation between propositions:

‘A contains B’ is a true proposition if ‘A non-B’ entails a contradiction. This applies both to categorical and to hypothetical propositions (Cout, 407).

Hence A∈B ↔ ¬P(A~B) may be “translated” into (α→β) ↔ ¬◊(α∧¬β). This formula unmistakably shows that Leibniz’s conditional is not a material but rather a strict implication. As Rescher already noted in (1954: 10), Leibniz’s account provides a definition of “entailment in terms of negation, conjunction, and the notion of possibility”, which coincides with the modern definition of strict implication put forward, for example, in Lewis & Langford (1932: 124): “The relation of strict implication can be defined in terms of negation, possibility, and product [...] Thus ‘p implies q’ [...] is to mean ‘It is false that it is possible that p should be true and q false’”. This definition is almost identical with Leibniz’s explanation in “Analysis Particularum”: “Thus if I say ‘If L is true it follows that M is true’, this means that one cannot suppose at the same time that L is true and that M is false” (AE VI, 4, 656).

Given the above “translation”, the basic axioms and theorems of the algebra of concepts can be transformed into the following laws of the algebra of propositions:

IMPL 1            α → α

IMPL 2            (α → β) ∧ (β→γ) → (α→γ)

IMPL 3            (α → β) ↔ (α ↔ α∧β)

CONJ 1          (α → β∧γ) ↔ ((α→β) ∧ (α→γ))

CONJ 2          α∧β → α

CONJ 3          α∧β → β

CONJ 4          α∧α ↔ α

CONJ 5          α∧β ↔ β∧α

NEG 1            ¬¬α ↔ α

NEG 2            ¬(α ↔ ¬α)

NEG 3            (α → β) ↔ (¬β→ ¬α)

NEG 4            ¬α → ¬(α∧β)

NEG 5            ◊α → ((α → β) → ¬(α → ¬β))

NEG 6            (α ∧¬α) → β

POSS 1           (α → β) ∧ ◊α → ◊β

POSS 2           (α → β) ↔ ¬◊(α ∧ ¬β)

POSS 3           ¬◊(α ∧ ¬α)

5. Works on Modal Logic

When people credit Leibniz with having anticipated “Possible-worlds-seman­tics”, they mostly refer to his philosophical writings, in particular to the “Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain” (NE) and to the metaphysical speculations of the “Essais de theodicée” (Theo) of 1710. Leibniz argues there that while there are infinitely many ways how God might have created the world, the real world that God finally decided to create is the best of all possible worlds. As a matter of fact, however, Leibniz has much more to offer than this over-optimistic idea (which was rightly criticized by Voltaire and, for example, in part 2 of chapter 8 of Hume’s “An Enquiry concerning Human Under­standing”). In what follows we briefly consider some of Leibniz’s early logical works where

(1)  the idea that a necessary proposition is true in each possible world (while a possible proposition is true in at least one possible world) is formally elaborated, and where

(2)  the close relation between alethic and deontic modalities is unveiled.

a. Possible-Worlds-Semantics for Alethic Modalities

The fundamental logical relations between necessity, ☐, possibility, ◊, and impossibility can be expressed, for example, by:

NEC 1            ☐(α) ↔ ¬◊(¬α)

NEC 2            ¬◊(α) ↔ ☐(¬α).

These laws were familiar already to logicians long before Leibniz. However, Leibniz "proved" these relations by means of an admirably clear analysis of modal operators in terms of “possible cases”, that is, possible worlds:

Possible is whatever can happen or what is true in some cases

Impossible is whatever cannot happen or what is true        in no […] case

Necessary is whatever cannot not happen or what is true in every […] case

Contingent is whatever can not happen or what is [not] true in some case. (AE VI, 1, 466).

As this quotation shows, Leibniz uses the notion of contingency not in the modern sense of ‘neither necessary nor impossible’ but as the simple negation of ‘necessary’. The quoted analysis of the truth-conditions for modal propositions entails the validity not only of NEC 1, 2, but also of:

NEC 3            ☐α → ◊(α)

NEC 4            ¬◊(α) → ¬(α).

Leibniz "proves" these laws by reducing them to corresponding laws for quantifiers such as: If α is true in each case, then α is true in at least one case. In the “Modalia et Elementa Juris Naturalis” of around 1679, Leibniz mentions NEC 3 and NEC 4 in passing: “Since everything which is necessary is possible, so everything that is impossible is contingent, that is, can fail to happen” (AE IV, 4, 2759). A very elliptic "proof" of these laws was already sketched in the “Elementa juris naturalis” of 1669/70 (AE VI, 1, 469).

It cannot be overlooked, however, that Leibniz’s semi-formal truth conditions, even when combined with his later views on possible worlds, fail to come up to the standards of modern possible worlds semantics, since nothing in Leibniz’s considerations corresponds to an accessibility relation among worlds.

b. Basic Principles of Deontic Logic

As has already been pointed out by Schepers (1972) and Kalinowski (1974), Leibniz saw very clearly that the logical relations between the deontic modalities obligatory, permitted and forbidden exactly mirror the corresponding relations between necessary, possible and impossible, and that therefore all laws and rules of alethic modal logic may be applied to deontic logic as well.

Just like ‘necessary’, ‘contingent’, ‘possible’ and ‘impossible’ are related to each other, so also are ‘obligatory’, ‘not obligatory’, ‘permitted’, and ‘forbidden’ (AE VI, 4, 2762).

This structural analogy goes hand in hand with the important discovery that the deontic notions can be defined by means of the alethic notions plus the additional “logical” constant of a morally perfect man (“vir bonus”). Such a virtuous man is characterized by the requirements that he strictly obeys all laws, always acts in such a way that he does no harm to anybody, and is benevolent to all other people. Given this understanding of a “vir bonus”, Leibniz explains:

Obligatory is what is necessary for the virtuous man as such.

Not obligatory is what is contingent for the virtuous man as such.

Permitted is what is possible for the virtuous man as such.

Forbidden is what is impossible for the virtuous man as such (Grua, 605).

If we express the restriction of the modal operators ☐ and ◊ to the virtuous man by means of a subscript 'v', these definitions can be formalized as follows (where the letter ‘E’ reminding of the German notion ‘erlaubt’ is taken instead of 'P' for 'permitted' in order to avoid confusions with the operator of possibility):

DEON 1          O(α) ↔ ☐v(α)

DEON 2          E(α) ↔ ◊v(α)

DEON 3          F(α) ↔ ¬◊v(α).

Now, as Leibniz mentioned in passing, all that is unconditionally necessary will also be necessary for the virtuous man:

NEC 5             ☐(α) → ☐v(α).

Hence (as was shown in more detail in Lenzen (2005)), Leibniz’s derivation of the fundamental laws for the deontic operators from corresponding laws of the alethic modal operators proceeds in much the same way as the modern reduction of deontic logic to alethic modal logic "rediscovered" almost 300 years after Leibniz by Anderson (1958).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Abbreviations for Leibniz’s works

  • AE       German Academy of Science (ed.), G. W. Leibniz, Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, Series VI, „Philosophische Schriften“, Darmstadt 1930, Berlin 1962 ff.
  • Cout   Louis Couturat (ed.), Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz, Paris (Presses universitaires de France) 1903, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1961.
  • GI      Generales Inquisitiones de Analysi Notionum et Veritatum; first edited in Cout, 356-399; text-critical edition in A, VI 4, 739-788; English trans­lation in LLP, 47-87.
  • GP     C. I. Gerhardt (ed.), Die philosophischen Schriften von G. W. Leibniz, seven volumes Berlin/Halle 1875-90, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1965.
  • Grua   Gaston Grua (ed.), G. W. Leibniz – Textes Inédits, two Volumes, Paris (Presses Universitaires de France) 1948.
  • LH       Eduard Bodemann (ed.), Die Leibniz-Handschriften der Königlichen Öffentlichen Bibliothek zu Hannover, Hannover 1895, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1966.
  • LLP   G. H. R. Parkinson (ed.), Leibniz Logical Papers – A Selection, Oxford (Clarendon Press), 1966.
  • NE      Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain – Par l’Auteur du Système de l’Harmonie Preestablie, in GP 5, 41-509.
  • Theo  Essais de Theodicée sur la Bonté de Dieu, la Liberté de l’Homme et l’Origine du Mal, in GP 6, 21-436.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Anderson, Alan Ross (1958): “A Reduction of Deontic Logic to Alethic Modal Logic”, in Mind LXVII, 100-103.
  • Arnauld, Antoine & Nicole, Pierre (1683) : La Logique ou L’Art de Penser, 5th edition, reprint 1965 Paris (Presses universitaires de France).
  • Burkhardt, Hans (1980): Logik und Semiotik in der Philosophie von Leibniz, München (Philosophia Verlag).
  • Couturat, Louis (1901): La Logique de Leibniz d’après des documents inédits, Paris (Félix Alcan).
  • Dürr, Karl (1930): Neue Beleuchtung einer Theorie von Leibniz - Grundzüge des Logikkalküls, Darmstadt.
  • Euler, Leonhard (1768): Lettres à une princesse d'Allemagne sur quelques sujets de physique et de philosophie, St Petersburg, 1768–1772.
  • Hamilton, William (1861): Lectures on Metaphysics and Logic, ed. by H.L. Mansel & J. Veitch, Edinburgh, London (William Blackwood); reprint Stuttgart Bad Cannstadt 1969.
  • Ishiguro, Hidé (1972): Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language, London (Duckworth).
  • Kalinowski, George (1974): “Un logicien déontique avant la lettre: Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz”, in Archiv für Rechts- und Sozialphilosophie 60, 79-98.
  • Kauppi, Raili (1960): Über die Leibnizsche Logik mit besonderer Berücksichti­gung des Problems der Intension und der Extension, Helsinki (Acta Philosophica Fennica).
  • Kneale, William and Martha (1962): The Development of Logic, Oxford (Clarendon).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1984): “Leibniz und die Boolesche Algebra”, in Studia Leibnitiana 16, 187-203.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1986): “‘Non est’ non est ‘est non’ – Zu Leibnizens Theorie der Negation”, in Studia Leibnitiana 18, 1-37.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1989): “Arithmetical vs. 'Real' Addition – A Case Study of the Relation between Logic, Mathematics, and Metaphysics in Leibniz”, in N. Rescher (ed.), Leibnizian Inquiries – A Group of Essays, Lanham, 149-157.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1990): Das System der Leibnizschen Logik, Berlin (de Gruyter).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004a): Calculus Universalis – Studien zur Logik von G. W. Leibniz, Paderborn (mentis).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004b): “Leibniz’s Logic”, in D. Gabbay & J. Woods (eds.) The Rise of Modern Logic – From Leibniz to Frege (Handbook of the History of Logic, vol. 3), Amsterdam (Elsevier), 1-83.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004c): “Logical Criteria for Individual(concept)s”, in M. Carrara, A. M. Nunziante & G. Tomasi (eds.), Individuals, Minds, and Bodies: Themes from Leibniz, Stuttgart (Steiner), 87-107.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2005): “Leibniz on Alethic and Deontic Modal Logic”. In D. Berlioz & F. Nef (eds.), Leibniz et les Puissances du Langage, Paris (Vrin), 2005, 341-362.
  • Lewis, Clarence I. & Langford, Cooper H. (1932): Symbolic Logic, New York, 21959 (Dover Publications).
  • Liske M.-Th. (1994): "Ist eine reine Inhaltslogik möglich? Zu Leibniz’ Begriffs­theorie", in Studia Leibnitiana XXVI, 31-55.
  • Lukasiewicz, Jan (1951): Aristotle’s Syllogistic – From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic, Oxford (Clarendon Press).
  • Mugnai, Massimo (1992): Leibniz’s Theory of Relations, Stuttgart (Steiner).
  • Poser, Hans (1969): Zur Theorie der Modalbegriffe bei G. W. Leibniz, Wiesbaden (Steiner).
  • Rescher, Nicholas (1954): “Leibniz’s interpretation of his logical calculus”, in Journal of Symbolic Logic 19, 1-13.
  • Rescher, Nicholas (1979): Leibniz – An Introduction to his Philosophy, London (Billing & Sons).
  • Sanchez-Mazas, Miguel (1979): “Simplification de l’arithmétisation leibniti­enne de la syllogistique par l’expression arithmétique de la notion intensionelle du 'non ens'”, in Studia Leibnitiana Sonderheft 8, 46-58.
  • Schepers, Heinrich (1972): “Leibniz‘ Disputationen ‚De Conditionibus‘: An­sätze zu einer juristischen Aussagenlogik” in Studia Leibnitiana Supplementa XV, 1-17.
  • Schupp, Franz (ed.) (1982): G. W. Leibniz, Allgemeine Untersuchungen über die Analyse der Begriffe und Wahrheiten, Hamburg (Meiner).
  • Schupp, Franz (ed.) (2000): G. W. Leibniz, Die Grundlagen des logischen Kalküls, Hamburg (Meiner).
  • Swoyer, Chris (1995): “Leibniz on Intension and Extension”, in Noûs 29, 96-114.
  • Sotirov, Vladimir (1999): “Arithmetizations of Syllogistic à la Leibniz”, in Journal of Applied Non-Classical Logics 9, 387-405.
  • Venn, John (1881): Symbolic Logic, London (MacMillan).


Author Information

Wolfgang Lenzen
University of Osnabrück

Hugo Grotius (1583—1645)

GrotiusHugo Grotius was a Dutch humanist and jurist whose philosophy of natural law had a major impact on the development of seventeenth century political thought and on the moral theories of the Enlightenment. Valorized by contemporary international theorists as the father of international law, his work on sovereignty, international rights of commerce and the norms of just war continue to inform theories of the international legal order. His major work, De Jure Belli ac Pacis (The Rights of War and Peace), is particularly notable in this respect, as well as Mare Liberum, a doctrine in favor of the freedom of the seas, which is considered an antecedent, inspiration and the backbone of the modern law of the sea.

Grotius was heavily influenced by classical philosophy, most prominently Aristotle and the Stoics, as well as by the contemporary humanist tradition and the late-medieval Scholastics. Caught up in the religious strife of the Reformation, Grotius promoted an irenic vision that would unite and reconcile the Christian Church on the principles of civil religion and toleration. He was well known in his time as much for his poetry and philosophy of religion as for his work on law and politics but is best remembered for his influence on theories of the social contract, natural rights and the laws of war.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Irenicism and Tolerance
    1. Religion and Civil Authority
    2. Relations with Non-Christians
    3. Christian Unity and Peace
  3. Sovereignty and Imperialism
    1. Divisible Sovereignty
    2. Resistance, War and Empire
  4. Natural Right and the Law of Nations
    1. Obligations from Nature and Custom
    2. Just War: Jus ad Bellum
    3. Just War: Jus in Bello
  5. Scholarly Interest in Grotius
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

Huig de Groot, best known by the Latinized name Hugo Grotius, began his life in the commercial town of Delft while, in 1583, the Dutch Republic persevered through a second decade of war for independence from Hapsburg rule and was already positioning itself for ascendancy as an overseas trading power. Born into a family with standing among the city elite and connections to the recently founded University of Leiden, young Hugo would find many opportunities to develop his considerable talents for scholarly pursuits even as a child. His family tutored him in Greek and Latin at an early age, introduced him to classical letters, and brought him up in the disciplines of Reformed faith. So outstanding were his gifts for intellectual work that he was welcomed to enroll at Leiden University at the mere age of eleven. At the university, the boy de Groot became a favored student of some of the most celebrated scholars of the time, discovering his talents in a whole range of subjects in the liberal arts and new sciences. His reputation as a promising young man of letters would open a number of doors for him in the political life of the time, where humanist expertise was a valued asset. The most auspicious of these opportunities came as he was preparing for life beyond the university. In 1598, no less a figure than Jan van Oldenbarnevelt, the Grand Pensionary and most influential personality in Dutch politics, invited Grotius to accompany his delegation to the French court. The embassy, which ultimately failed in its aim to renew the king’s military support against Spain, nonetheless brought Grotius into the fold of high politics and even staked him a reputation with the French court when Henry IV lauded the learned youth as “the miracle of Holland.” The connections he made in France enabled Grotius to extend his stay and earn a Doctor of Laws degree from the University of Orléans before returning to Holland the following year.

Entering into practice as a lawyer in The Hague, Grotius took advantage of chances to hone his rhetorical skills and found time to devote to his diverse scholarly interests. His earliest writings to go into print included several imitations of classical verse and translations of significant works in compass navigation and astronomy, the latter being of keen interest to his friends invested in the burgeoning overseas trade. In 1601, he published a tragedy, Adamus Exul (Adam in Exile), that earned him instant acclaim as a poet; it was a work that John Milton would later study in preparing his Paradise Lost. While Grotius prized these pursuits more highly than the mundane work of a lawyer, he always strove to please his patrons and clients. Indeed, his most lasting contributions to political thought took shape in the course of his professional duties during this period.

In 1604, Grotius was drawn into the sensational controversy over privateering in the Southeast Asian trade. The United Dutch East India Company had been rising quickly as a major player in European overseas commerce, and Grotius shared the view of many of his associates involved in the trade that the Company not only buoyed up the young republic with wealth but also weakened its adversaries by cutting into Iberian dominance of the East Indian routes. Still, acts of piracy by a private concern did not sit well in the public opinion of many citizens and allies. When asked by a friend with Company connections to write a brief justifying a recent and very lucrative seizure of Spanish cargo, Grotius went on to produce not only an ardent defense of the capture but an investigation into the deep principles of law that connected those separated by nation and culture. The resulting manuscript, provisionally titled De Indis (On the Indies), was never published in full until long after Grotius’ death (appearing in 1868 as Commentary on the Laws of Prize and Booty). It was the young jurist’s first systematic work on the problems of international affairs and was in many ways his most philosophically developed. Many of the arguments worked out in the manuscript—that there is a basic law of nature determined by the need to reconcile self-preservation with social life, that the authority to govern and even to punish derive from the rights of natural persons prior to the founding of civil societies, and that claims to jurisdiction over the open seas are invalid—would give direction to his later works.

In fact, the last of these arguments would appear in print in 1609 as the anonymous pamphlet, Mare Liberum (The Free Seas). The pamphlet, which Grotius pulled directly from the text of De Indis, once again served the interests of those in the Dutch political and commercial establishment that were insisting upon the right of access to overseas routes in the ongoing negotiations for a truce with the Spanish. The work argued not only that the Spanish claims to a trading monopoly in the Southeast Asia and elsewhere failed to square with the facts—that these were rights conferred by papal authority or acquired by just conquest—but that there was, in principle, no basis for any monopoly on access to the seas. The freedom of the seas was entailed by the very nature of private property. To privately own a thing requires that one can occupy it, taking it out of the common store, and that one can make full use of it. The sea cannot be contained and is too plentiful for its usefulness to be exhausted by a few; hence, no one can take exclusive ownership of the sea. The seas remain open to all. This question was of great importance in European relations during this period of intense competition between aspiring overseas empires, and Grotius’ work would frame the intense debate to follow. During this time in his early legal career, he penned a number of other manuscripts touching on matters of international relations that, while mostly unpublished, shaped his later work on the subject. The Parellelon Rerumpublicarum (composed 1601-2) explored the concept of ‘good faith’ in dealings with other nations through some flattering comparisons among the customs of the Greek, Roman and Dutch peoples. In his Commentary on Eleven Theses (circa 1602-08), Grotius worked out an understanding of the ruling power of a state—its sovereignty—and its relation to the principles of just war.

Having proved the usefulness of his talents to the ruling elite, Grotius’ star continued to rise. He gained recognition from Prince Maurits of Orange, the executive and military leader of the United Provinces, when in 1607, the prince appointed him as attorney general of the provinces of Holland, Zeeland and West Friesland. It was during this time that he became engaged to be married to a young woman from a distinguished family in Zeeland, Maria van Reigersberch. Her partnership and personal courage would carry the family through a tumultuous life that the young couple could not have expected at the time of their wedding in 1608. Soon thereafter, Maria gave birth to the first of seven children. As his focus shifted from legal practice to public service, Grotius began to put a number of his writings into press. His second celebrated tragedy, The Passion of Christ, came out in 1608, followed by the anonymous Mare Liberum in 1609 and a political history of the old Dutch republic, De Antiquitate Reipublicae Batavicae, in 1610. The historical account provided ideological leverage for the position that Holland had persisted in its republican form of government despite the princely claims of the Hapsburgs. The governing States of Holland commissioned Grotius to write a detailed history of the conflict with Spain, which he submitted in 1612. The States declined, likely due to the delicate truce, to publicize the work, leaving the Annales et Historiae de Rebus Belgicus to rest until his sons brought it out posthumously in 1657. Opportunity for higher office came again when, in 1612, the town council of Rotterdam offered Grotius the mayoral position of Pensionary. The title brought with it a seat in the States of Holland where he would collaborate more closely with his mentor, Oldenbarnevelt, and key players in provincial and national politics.

The political controversy that would end up defining Grotius’ tenure in office began with small rumblings when, in 1608, the professor of theology at the University of Leiden, Jacob Arminius, put forth a doctrine that challenged key features of the reigning Calvinist orthodoxy concerning predestination (see below: Irenicism and Tolerance). Calvinist church officials and divines came out strongly against the preaching of such a view. Though Arminius died the following year, the conflict escalated in a way that pitted the church establishment against the civil authorities over the question of who could rule on such doctrinal disputes. Grotius shared with many in the government of Holland some sympathies with the Arminian view but a desire above all to prevent such matters from disturbing the peace. He had been composing, during this time, a manuscript on the idea that all faiths shared a set of core doctrines, a viewpoint capable of promoting a certain equanimity towards squabbles over the finer points of theology. This was in any case the political attitude Grotius favored, and while he never published the Meletius manuscript, he developed several writings on the role of the state in managing conflicts over religion. The pamphlet, Ordinum Hollandiae et Westfrisiae pietas (1613), defended the ‘piety’ of the governments of Holland and Westfriesland in imposing a policy of toleration that allowed Arminians to preach their dissenting doctrine. Grotius himself had drafted the policy, which failed in its aim of mollifying the factions and, in fact, heightened the conflict between the civil and ecclesiastical authorities. Convinced that the practice of religion was a concern proper to civil magistrates, Grotius set about justifying his views in a longer treatise. De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa Sacra argued that, to avoid a conflict of rights, there must be only one final authority within a state on how religion is to be practiced, that because of its mandate to keep civil peace and form responsible citizens this authority ought to come under the civil power, and that civil magistrates would do well to limit their judgments to the core doctrines Grotius had worked out in Meletius. He developed, though never published, the manuscript of De Imperio as the political conflict continued to escalate during 1614-17. His sympathies with the Arminian theology also grew during this period, and in 1617 he took it upon himself to brush back the charges of heresy with the publication of a theological work, Defensio Fidei Catholicae de Satisfactione Christi adversus Faustum Socinum.

As Grotius was being drawn further into the controversy, it came to consume national politics. The orthodox Calvinists, who were a majority at the national level and now had the backing of Prince Maurits, were demanding a national synod to settle the matter. This set up a standoff between Maurits, the national executive and commander of the armed forces, and Oldenbarnevelt, the most influential figure in the States assembly. Oldenbarnevelt led the elites of Holland, including Grotius, in blocking the synod and managing the dispute at the provincial level. That policy culminated in a decision, when riots broke out in 1617, to authorize local militias to suppress the disorder. Maurits denounced the act as an offense against his military authority, and he seized the opportunity to turn the tide against his political adversaries. At the end of an extended political and military campaign to push the Arminian supporters out of the establishment, he ordered the arrest of Oldenbarnevelt and his key supporters in August 1618. Grotius, with his mentor, was locked up and set for trial. A national synod, the famous Synod of Dort, was scheduled. Though incensed at the military coup d’etat against the sovereign institutions of Holland, Grotius calmly petitioned Maurits and the national States-General to no effect. The trials commenced the following year, and Grotius saw his mentor condemned to death for high treason. On May 18, 1619, his own sentence came down: confiscation of property and life imprisonment.

Although he would strive for the rest of his life to vindicate himself and lift the disgrace of the charges from himself and his family, Grotius entered at the age of thirty-six into his term of imprisonment in the castle Loevestein. The only solace of his confinement was that his family was allowed to reside with him and that on her regular leaves his wife Maria was able to bring back books and papers. The scholar was able to turn his isolation to some greater purpose. In Loevestein, Grotius renewed a number of neglected projects. He wrote, fully in didactic verse, a more systematic treatment of his view that there are essential elements common to all religions and that the doctrines of Christianity were recognizable through reason as the most consistent and highest expression of the common faith. The work, initially composed in Dutch, would serve as the basis for his renowned De Veritate Religionis Christiane (The Truth of the Christian Religion). Through his work in law and legal history, he had conceived the plan of writing a rigorous guidebook on jurisprudence of Holland in the vernacular of the Dutch language. The later publication, in 1631, of Inleidinge to the Hollandsche Rechts-geleerdheid (Introduction the Jurisprudence of Holland) would eventually give his book a status in Dutch law analogous to Blackstone’s Commentaries in the English system. Grotius was convinced that he could achieve the same kind of ordered treatment of the concepts, principles and precedents governing relations at the international level. Closed within the walls of his cell, he reached out for a global view of human affairs and prepared parts of what would become the massive treatise, De Jure Belli ac Pacis (The Rights of War and Peace). At the same time, Grotius was looking beyond the walls of Loevestein with a mind for a more immediate scheme: escape. He knew that he had support in the court of Louis XIII in France, and his hopes for reestablishing himself pointed towards Paris. Maria and the family’s young maid-servant, Elsje van Houwening, hatched the plan for escape. On March 22, 1621, Maria made arrangements for a chest of books to be shipped to the nearby town of Gorcum, then helped her husband into the cramped chest and watched Elsje accompany the guards as they unwittingly delivered their prisoner into the hands of friends. A month later, Grotius was in Paris, separated from his family, exiled from his beloved country, yet free.

The long period Grotius spent in exile saw the publication of his most remembered works. Having secured the support of Louis XIII and being reunited with his family, he prepared several manuscripts that he hoped would restore him to prominence. The Apologeticus, appearing in 1622, was straight to the purpose: it contained a full defense of his conduct as a public official of Holland. Despite his earnest pleas of loyalty and the best efforts of his friends, the States-General spurned his arguments and authorized a bounty on him. He turned his attention to the scholarly projects begun in Loevestein. The treatise on the universal law of nature and nations, divided into three hefty books, grew out of the reflections on the subject he had begun twenty years prior. Its first book developed an account of natural justice, so central to his earlier arguments about the Southeast Asian trade, and laid out a broad framework for judging “controversies of any and every kind, as are likely to arise” (JBP I.I.i)—those among politically sovereign entities, private parties, or rival camps within a state. The lengthy second book provided a grounding for the rights in one’s person, property, and sovereignty (subjects he was revisiting from Mare Liberum and his unpublished commentaries) and a detailed consideration of the ways such rights could be acquired, transferred, lost, and protected by recourse to war. The third book, dramatizing the gap between the prevailing customs of warfare and the demands placed on us by a more humane conscience, considers what responsibilities parties have to all those they impact in wartime and in upholding good faith in efforts to build the peace. Many of the arguments of the work were forged in Grotius’ career as an advocate and public official, though he insists in the Prolegomena to the treatise that his perspective in the work is that of a mathematician, abstracting away from particular facts and controversies of the day. When the first edition of De Jure Belli ac Pacis made its appearance in 1625, its readers would have no shortage of conflicts to which to apply its ideas about war and peace, from the campaigns of conquest and appropriation overseas to the long-raging religious conflicts on the continent that were escalating into what would be the Thirty Years War.

Grotius continued, while in France, to write and visit scholars. His Latin edition of The Truth of Christian Religion came out in 1627. It would become his most widely read and translated work. Despite the unreliability of his pension from King Louis, he turned down some tempting offers to serve as a diplomat for other nations and instead renewed his efforts to rehabilitate his standing in the Netherlands. Upon the death of Prince Maurits, Grotius returned to Holland in 1631 in hopes of finding favor with the new Prince of Orange, Frederick Henry, but an arrest warrant from the States-General forced him to flee and take up refuge in Hamburg. Grotius and his wife remained for more than two years in the city without any great prospects. He set himself to composing a third major tragedy, Sophompaneas (Joseph), which would appear in 1635. By that time, his work on the laws of war had brought opportunity to his doorstep. In 1634, he was called to meet with the Swedish High Chancellor, Oxenstierna, who informed him that the recently slain King Gustavus Adolphus had been a great admirer of De Jure Belli and expressed a desire to bring Grotius into the service of Sweden. A major power, Sweden had risen up as a champion of the Protestant cause in the bloody war that gripped Europe, and Grotius was asked to provide counsel to the young queen and serve as her ambassador to another key power, France. The position required that he renounce his Dutch citizenship in order to declare his loyalty to the Swedish crown. Though he never let go of the hope of returning to his home, he accepted. The de Groot family would once again take up residence in Paris.

As ambassador, Grotius was charged with negotiating the terms of French support for the Protestant alliance. The relations were especially fraught due to the delicate position that the French crown, under the guidance of Cardinal Richelieu, had carved out between its opposition to Hapsburg power and its defense of Catholicism. As France increasingly entered the battle fray, much of Grotius’ duty was directed to the war effort. His scholarly projects from the late 1630s-40s, however, took as their object a long-cherished goal: the reconciliation and peace of the Christian community. He began in 1638 on a scriptural commentary that would deflate Protestant rhetoric charging that the Pope was the Antichrist. That same year he slipped an anonymous treatise through an Amsterdam press defending the lay administration of the Eucharist. He then released two lengthy collections of annotations, one on the New Testament and one on the Old, which emphasized the ethical role of the scriptures over the more divisive questions of theology. Building on the idea of shared core doctrines he had explored in his earlier manuscripts, he frankly promoted his vision for a reconciled faith in an appeal printed in Paris in 1942, Via ad Pacem Ecclesiasticam (The Way to Church Peace). Grotius had great hopes that the time was ripe for this vision, but he was disappointed when his arguments were swallowed up in the same old sectarian vitriol.

Having passed the age of sixty, Grotius met with some relief his recall to Swedish court in 1645. The Queen offered to settle his family in Sweden, but he instead requested a passport so that he could rejoin Maria and pursue opportunities elsewhere. He embarked in August in the midst of a terrible storm that damaged the ship and washed it upon the German coast. The ordeal left him ill and weather-beaten. With the aid of servants, he made it to the town of Rostock where he found a hospice. His condition worsened, and death came on August 28, 1645. Arrangements were made to convey his remains to Delft, where the town of his birth bestowed him with the honor that he could not regain in life by interring his body in the Nieuwe Kerk alongside the most celebrated figures of the republic. Maria resettled in Holland, and their sons set about preparing, from Grotius’ papers, updated editions and previously unpublished manuscripts for the press. De Jure Belli ac Pacis, especially, would come to have enduring influence as the Enlightenment philosophers of the next generations embraced its framework of natural jurisprudence as a model for a modern science of law and morals. His work would become a point of departure for those natural lawyers focusing on the law among nations, from Pufendorf and Barbeyrac to Thomasius and Vattel. It would inspire radical ideas about natural rights and the social contract in the Anglo-American political discourses of Hobbes, Locke, Jefferson and Madison. For the Scottish Enlightenment, it would be required reading, informing the moral theories of Carmichael, Hutcheson, Hume and Smith. As natural jurisprudence gave way to positivism and idealism in 19th-century European thought, the place of Grotius receded in moral and political theory, but his work would be recovered in the context of emerging ideas about the international legal order as the next century approached. His work is most widely known today among those working on international relations and law, though there has been rapidly expanding scholarship on his contributions to political thought, ethics, and the philosophy of religion.

2. Irenicism and Tolerance

In the politics of the Dutch Republic and with regard to the broader religious strife in Europe, Grotius fashioned himself as an irenicist, one who seeks to bring the different denominations of Christianity together. The inflammatory conflicts among the Christian churches, which remained a persistent cause of war and upheaval in the political life of European societies, was in Grotius’ view largely attributable to excesses of dogmatism (see Heering 2004). If dogmatic claims could be reduced to an agreeable set of core tenets, he reasoned, then the various sects would have grounds for cooperating towards a reunified Christian church while allowing more esoteric matters to be contested without posing a threat to peace. This hope for Christian peace and unity characterizes Grotius’ theologically-oriented works from his early Meletius (1611) to Via ad Pacem Ecclesiasticam (1642), among his latest writings at the height of the Thirty Years War.

a. Religion and Civil Authority

In the early decades of the 17th century when Grotius’ was cutting his teeth in Dutch politics, the temperature was rising on a theological dispute concerning salvation and freedom of the will. The reformed churches, which had the backing of the civil authorities, were founded on orthodox Calvinist doctrine. The standard Calvinist view of salvation held that God’s choice of who would be saved preceded the act of creation; this grace was, consequently, not a status that could be earned through good works but rather was predestined. This view was consistent with the dominant Protestant interpretations of scripture and represented a social and ethical worldview that was compelling to the reformed faithful. Yet this view also carried the ethically troubling implication that individual choice makes no difference to how one stands with God and, as the Leiden professor of theology, Jacob Arminius, would argue, did not account for elements of scripture that seemed to acknowledge a role for human will. Arminius maintained that God’s saving grace was on offer to anyone while still accepting the basic Calvinist premise that, prior to any human act, God had already determined who He would actually elect to everlasting happiness. The paradox could be resolved by recognizing that God’s grace might be resisted. This elegant solution enabled Arminius to account for freedom of the human will while retaining the key Protestant tenet that grace alone, not works, qualifies the elect. The Arminian view of salvation, to draw on Richard Tuck’s illuminating analogy, understands God’s offer of grace to the elect to be much like a parent’s offer to buy something for a child: “the child can refuse the offer, but he cannot purchase the present himself” (Tuck 1993 p. 182). While representing a significant revision to orthodox Calvinism, this view remained consistent with the larger doctrine.

The political question, however, was whether adherents of the Arminian position should be allowed to teach it within the publically established churches. Grotius’ writings from this period confront both the theological and political aspects of the debate. On the question of theology his sympathies laid with Arminius, and his defenses of the view led up to the publication of the substantial De Satisfactione (published in 1617), which distinguished many of the Arminian tenets from the ‘Socianian’ heresies charged by the view’s opponents. Politically, the Arminian preachers were seeking a policy of toleration within the public churches. Grotius and others aligned with Oldenbarnevelt recognized the advantages of such a policy for preserving quiet in the republic. Characteristically, Grotius saw the policy as rooted in philosophical concerns. As early as the (unpublished) manuscript Meletius (1611), he was developing a philosophy of religion according to which all faiths shared core beliefs about the nature of divinity and its role in human life. While this view stressed commonality, it did not entail pluralism. A religious tradition may possess a stronger claim to truth than others in virtue of its consistency with the central doctrines and the credibility of its supporting testimony; for Grotius, Christianity held this title. (This defense of Christianity is most fully developed in Grotius’ most widely published and popular work, On the Truth of the Christian Religion.) Yet Christian tradition, too, had a further set of core doctrines which were necessary for proper worship and for the promotion of responsible citizenship. The church could accommodate friendly debate over finer matters of theology as long as it was firmly rooted in the necessary articles of faith. This philosophical framework, while not made fully public at the time, undergirded Grotius’ advocacy of the toleration policy, which the States of Holland would eventually adopt.

The policy, Grotius well understood, required not only justification but also legitimacy: in defining acceptable doctrines, the civil authority was asserting itself in sacred matters. Grotius addressed this issue in his 1613 pamphlet defending the toleration policy, Ordinum Hollandiae et Westfrisiae pietas, and went on to develop the argument for the central principles into a major essay on the authority of civil government over the public practice of religion. De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa sacra (1614-17, unpublished) argued that the supreme civil power holds legitimate authority over all matters concerning the public interest, whether sacred or profane. In addition to finding support from scripture and tradition, Grotius grounds his case on the simple Aristotelian argument that, because the commands of multiple authorities would allow for conflicting obligations, there can be only one supreme authority in a jurisdiction (ch. 1). Holding this authority enables the supreme power, then, to preserve civil peace as well as to promote, through the effects of religion, the formation of obedient and upright citizens. The bulk of the work is thus occupied with defending the plausibility of this conclusion by clearing away misconceptions and by reconciling it both with the variety of forms of political and legal organization and with the special calling of the church. To accept the authority of the civil power in religious matters, Grotius argues, does not imply that magistrates are competent to determine the truth of all fine points of theology: a wise ruler will make use of counsel from the most reliable pastors. With even greater wisdom, a ruler would do well to abstain from pronouncing on all but the most essential articles of faith, those that are necessary for salvation (ch. 6, 9). As an instance of an inessential matter in which a “prudent silence” recommends itself, he offers those “questions about the order of predestination and the reconciliation of human free will with grace” (ibid). The policy of the States of Holland, in this framework, was a form of containment: the policy defined the boundaries of permissible doctrine at the point that would endanger the salvation of those who accept it, while allowing the disagreements inside these bounds to play themselves out. Such was Grotius’ recommendation, in both theory and practice. At bottom, however, the policy had its validity not in view of its laudable tolerance but on Erastian grounds. (The citations in the work acknowledge the influence of Thomas Erastus, who a generation earlier had argued for the supreme authority of the state in church governance.) The central position of De imperio was that any policy issued by the civil power would be valid so long as it did not contradict God’s will. That this Erastian position made room for toleration and contributed to civil peace only added to its appeal.

b. Relations with Non-Christians

The principle of toleration guided Grotius’ handling of the Arminian conflict and also served as an ideal in his view of dealings with non-Christians. Among the groups that had found haven in the Netherlands from the Inquisition were Portuguese Jews, and Grotius was asked during his time as a public official to reconsider what ought to be the policy the States towards the presence and worship practices of Jewish communities. His Remonstrantie on the question was of a piece with his developing philosophy of public religion: Jewish worship could be consistent with the state interest in religion, as Judaism accepted the fundamental doctrines regarding God’s existence and concern for human conduct. The policy recommendation was to afford civil liberties and freedom of worship to Jews, under certain restrictions that would serve to “safeguard” the salvation of Christians. This meant, for instance, that Jewish synagogues would not enjoy the same freedom to preach to Christian audiences that could be granted to Arminian and Calvinist disputants, but Grotius maintained that this encumbered status was preferable to the other options in the field. He opposed forcing Jews to practice Christianity on the grounds that such a policy was incoherent, since faith cannot be forced, as well as sinful, since it would induce people to false professions. An alternative was to forbid Jewish worship altogether, but this would promote godlessness, which would be intolerable. Finally, to those who were calling for expulsion, Grotius gave a sustained response partly grounded in principles of natural law: the social bond that nature establishes among humans should not be severed except as punishment for crime. Jewish practice did not transgress natural law, and its faith supported civic life. It was proper, therefore, that Christians and Jews share social arrangements on the basis of common principles of public order and justice.

The same balance between Christian privilege and the potential for peaceful cooperation underwrote Grotius’ approach towards the expanding relationships between Europeans and non-Christian societies around the world. The principles of natural justice in De Jure Belli ac pacis—which grounded claims to sovereignty, property, and the fulfillment of pacts—were valid and binding in any human encounter, requiring no special relation to God. The principles would oblige us, in Grotius’ famous phrase, “even if we should concede (etiamsi daremus) that which cannot be conceded without the utmost wickedness, that there is no God, or that the affairs of men are of no concern to Him” (JBP Prol. 11). Mutual recognition of natural law provided the basis for any two parties to arrive at just and peaceful terms of association, most notably those concerning trade and alliances. This did not imply that all practices regarding religion were consistent with natural law. Because a sense of justice is not sufficient to motivate humans routinely to do right, the broader human society, even more than civil societies, depends upon religion to maintain order and instill reverence for its norms (see JBP Prol. 20 and II.XX.XLIV.6). To reject God involves not only the “utmost wickedness” but a criminal disregard for human society. Indeed, the two tenets that Grotius identifies—that there is a God and that human affairs are of concern to Him—constitute what he takes to be the core of religious belief, found in all societies. Those who oppose these core beliefs may be punished, by war if necessary, but differences among the religious are not, in themselves, grounds for war (JBP II.XX.XLVI-XLVIII). Pagans, polytheists, Jews and Muslims might fail to accept the “truths” of Christianity, but their participation in the common faith supports the basic ethical structure of society. Christianity, even under non-Christian sovereigns, yet has this privilege: that in virtue of its claim to truth, its adherents must not be punished for teaching the Gospel (JBP II.XX.XLIX). The right to suppress religious doctrine, which De imperio claimed for the civil power, extends only to teachings not essential to Christian salvation.

c. Christian Unity and Peace

The privileged status of Christianity among the world’s religions is the subject of The Truth of the Christian Religion. As in De Jure Belli, composed around the same time, Grotius argues that a basic understanding of divinity and its role in the world is accessible through the use of the natural capacity of reason alone. Such truths include not only the existence and providence of God, but also God’s oneness, perfection, causal responsibility for all that happens, and judgment in the afterlife. The proofs Grotius offers are not original but are borrowed from sources both ancient and recent, owning that people of varying sophistication have long been able to reason back to a necessary and singular ‘first cause’ and to grasp that the perfect nature of such a cause would not neglect the good of all creation (ch. 1).  While some of these points require more subtle thought than others, all people can in principle arrive at the conclusions through rational reflection. Christ, however, is known through history. To learn of redemption and of what is required for salvation, one needs access to particular facts about Christ’s coming and His call to the faithful. The relevant facts, still, are supported by reasonable inferences based on reliable testimony (the evangelists), the consensus of historians, and the evidence of miracles performed. This project of deriving religious knowledge through rational investigation is what later philosophers would call “natural religion.” Significantly, Grotius argues that these facts gain further confirmation when one recognizes that the doctrines of Christianity have the greatest intrinsic appeal. The Gospel has this appeal in virtue of the reward it promises (the eternal beatitude of the soul), the quality of its ethical teachings (obeying out of love rather than fear, showing love to neighbors and enemies, and so forth), and the impeccable character of its teacher, Christ (ch. 2). Experience and rational consideration, while sufficient to establish the truth of Christianity, may not convince as readily as inferences from mere reason. Indeed, immediate acceptance is not possible without God’s help. On these grounds, Grotius would argue in De Jure Belli that one may neither punish those who fail to embrace Christianity nor impose belief by force (II.XX.XLVIII). Christians would do better to impress non-believers with their ethical example and offer persuasive arguments for conversion.

To this end, De Veritate provides a detailed debunking of other faiths. While its arguments reveal that Grotius undertook a serious study of non-Christian religions—with the aid of friends such as the Hebrew and Arabic scholar, Thomas Erpenius—some of his characterizations are far from generous, repeating old slurs about Jewish animosity towards Christians and the violent character of Islam. The arguments of the book were, after all, calculated to more than one purpose. Grotius intended the book to be of special use to seamen, whom while off to many corners of the earth to establish Dutch trading interests, would encounter a dazzling diversity of religious belief that might not only elude their attempts at persuasion but also challenge their own faith. It was the Christian reader, most of all, who may need to be assured of the Gospel’s special claim to truth.

The further effect Grotius hoped De Veritate would have on its Christian readers was to impress upon them that, in the range of religious diversity, the similarities among Christians are much more significant than the differences. The irenicist program that Grotius pursued in his later years had two main prongs. The first provided a map for Christian reunification based upon minimal agreement regarding core doctrines, beyond which some difference of belief and practice could be accommodated. The second urged Christians to recognize that the most important lessons to be taken from scripture are its ethical teachings, not its dogmas. This was the simple, practical faith that he saw reflected in the earliest Christian community and in the Christian humanists, like Erasmus, whom he so much admired. It was also a faith of which civil authorities, responsible for civic peace and virtue, could be worthy custodians.

3. Sovereignty and Imperialism

Connecting the political and international thought of Grotius is his conception of sovereignty, the supreme right of governing (summum imperium). The mark of the sovereign power is that it “cannot be made void by any other human will” (JBP, I.III.viii). Within a state, it is the highest authority; internationally it encounters other sovereign powers, among whom none holds a superior right.

a. Divisible Sovereignty

The guiding idea in Grotius’ treatment of sovereignty, as with his treatment of rights generally, is that systems of rights are radically alterable through the ways people choose to dispose of those rights. As a result, societies will vary widely in how they organize the powers of sovereignty. Philosophers might argue for the advantages of one scheme or another, “but as there are several ways of living, some better than others, and every one may choose which he pleases of all those sorts; so a people may choose what form of government they please: neither is the right which the sovereign has over his subjects to be measured by this or that form, of which divers men have divers opinions, but by the extent of the will of those who conferred it upon him” (JBP I.III.viii). What justifies a scheme of rights is that it has arisen from the historical choices of their legitimate holders, not any features of its form. This principle gave Grotius a great deal of flexibility in defending different political arrangements, provided the facts of history for the given society would play along.

On one side, Grotius was able to argue against royalists who sought to define sovereignty as an indivisible package of prerogatives that could be vested in only a singular will. Grotius takes this claim, which Jean Bodin had advanced a generation earlier, at face value but treats indivisibility as a purely conceptual point: to institute civil power in a society consists in gathering up a certain package of governmental rights and in designating who will hold that power supremely. The rights of governing come as a package, but a society may, if it chooses, designate different holders for the various rights.

Grotius developed this position early in his career in an unpublished manuscript that he called Commentary in Eleven Theses. The practical divisibility of sovereignty is an indispensable premise for the political argument of the work, which defends the ongoing Dutch war against the rule of the king of Spain. Unlike earlier apologists, Grotius does not conceive of the war as a revolt based on right of a people to resist a tyrannical ruler but rather as a war between sovereign powers (see Borschberg 1994 pp. 169ff. and Keene 2002 pp. 45ff.). If one studies the history of rights in the Dutch case, Grotius argues, one finds that the Dutch people did not transfer all governing rights to a prince bur reserved some, in particular the right to levy taxes, to the States of Holland. While holding supreme power on many matters, the Spanish king had sought to usurp a further supreme power from the States, an act which provided them a just cause to wage war in defense of its right. Put in the language of sovereignty, the king possessed no right to render void the will of the States when it came to taxation, just as this particular right of the States could not render void the king’s rights in other matters: each was supreme within the scope of its own authority (cf. JBP I.IV.xiii). Grotius retained and systematized this conception of divisible sovereignty in De Jure Belli, where he also considered the criticism that such arrangements based on divided powers were recipes for civil strife. His answer insists on the principle with which he began: while one can point to inconveniences in any arrangements, the only relevant question in matters of right is whether those arrangements were the ones chosen (I.III.xvii).

On the other side of the political spectrum, Grotius argued against theories of popular sovereignty. The position of constitutionalist thinkers, such as those among the reforming Huguenots who would come to be called ‘monarchomachs,’ was that the right of kings to rule derives from the rights of the people; since some of these rights are inalienable, the representatives of the people retain a right to resist a regime that tyrannically usurps these rights. Grotius’ response was to grant that rights originate from the people but to argue that the people can choose to alienate whatever rights they wish, even up to the extreme of enslaving themselves to another (JBP, I.III.viii). Utter subjection to an absolute monarch is, therefore, entirely possible and consistent with the history of political arrangements in many societies. Grotius’ flexible approach enabled him to defend the republican principles alive in the Dutch provinces from one side of his mouth while shoring up the absolutist claims of his later patrons from the other. In his defense of the latter claims, we find Grotius even paying homage to the time-worn doctrine of Aristotle that some people are naturally suited to be slaves. Importantly, Grotius does not admit the doctrine as grounds for imposing slavery but rather repurposes it: the doctrine can explain why a people might choose of their own accord to hand over their full rights to the more prudent government of another. Ineptitude at self-rule, it turns out, is just one of many considerations that might factor into the selection of a form of government.

b. Resistance, War and Empire

Grotius’ understanding of sovereignty carries several implications for his theory of just war. The first concerns his position on the “right of resistance,” the hotly contested question of whether a subject people may ever justly depose a ruler for misgovernment. While Grotius rejects constitutionalist arguments that reserve inalienable rights to the people, he finds a way to preserve this rationale for resistance in a more limited form. It is unlikely that most civil societies would have been founded on utter subjection. In the absence of clear evidence that subjects have completely alienated their rights, one has to presume that rational people would have preserved their most basic rights against arbitrary treatment. This presumption attaches only in cases of “extreme necessity,” as when a government turns its sword on innocent subjects, and then only when resistance could be carried out without creating an even bloodier civil conflict (I.VI.vii). When Grotius invokes this argument from extreme necessity, he relies on what Richard Tuck has called a kind of interpretive charity (1979 pp. 79-80): since civil authority is a human institution, the bounds of which are derived from the wills of those who established it, one must credit the founders with intentions that would rationally advance, not undermine, the aims of civil association. (Compare the parallel reasoning in limiting the rights of property, Second, Grotius assigns a role in this context to third-party humanitarian intervention. Even if it should turn out that subjects must bear the most arbitrary assaults from their proper sovereign, a third-party would remain free from the special obligations that constrain subjects from resisting and could intervene on their behalf. Such interventions should only be attempted when it is evident that a government is committing gross injustices against its people—“such Tyrannies over subjects, as no good Man living can approve” (JBP II.XXV.viii). The third implication concerns Grotius’ complicated relation to imperialism. In defending the legitimacy of diverse forms of political authority, he is rejecting the principle behind those forms of imperialism that seek to impose a more enlightened form of rule for the good of the governed. Elsewhere in De Jure Belli he explicitly refutes the argument that slavery can be imposed on those who might be naturally suited to it (II.XXII.xii) and castigates those who claim rights of ‘discovery’ over lands already occupied by supposedly less enlightened folk (II.XXII.ix). On these points, he is in agreement with earlier critics of the Spanish conquests such as Francisco de Vitoria and Bartolome de las Casas.

The strategies of commercial imperialism, which characterized Dutch practice, found much more support in Grotius’ theory of just war (see generally, Tuck 1999 ch. 3, van Ittersum 2006, Wilson 2008, Thomson 2009). The whole concern of De Jure Belli is how to justly settle controversies in the dealings of those who do not live under a shared system of civil laws. In the context of global trade, such dealings will involve the claims of private parties as well as the contentions of kings and states. It ultimately falls to each party, when operating outside the jurisdiction of a common court, to judge the controversy based on the applicable standards of natural, customary, state and divine law. Significantly, Grotius maintains that such relations can be peaceful so long as those involved have a clear understanding of the law and hold themselves to norms of justice, equity, temperance, and humanity. Yet, just as magistrates duly back their rulings with force, those involved in a dispute have the right to redress injuries by means of war. Used rightly, De Jure Belli would provide all parties with a clear understanding of how the law applied to various disputes and educate them in how to render fair and responsible verdicts. However, used rightly, it would also give trading powers the flexibility to leverage their arrangements with non-Europeans and the justifications to uphold these arrangements with force. One stratagem it enabled was encroachment on local sovereignty (see Keene 2002 pp. 48ff and 79ff). Grotius’ position was firmly that non-Christian rulers could hold full title to sovereignty, but his view of sovereignty was that its marks could be divided up among various holders. A foreign trading power might enter into an alliance with a ruler that required him, for instance, to provide land for a trading ‘factory’ or deliver up his people’s labor. These arrangements do not, in themselves, transfer any mark of sovereignty, but Grotius argues that, if the foreign power (unjustly) usurps this right over time without being challenged, its “long possession” provides it with a claim to sovereignty that is now just (JBP I.III.XXI.10-11). Because marks of sovereignty can be divided off in this way, the foreign power can take over limited rights of its own without being guilty of usurping the broader authority of the king. Once the limited right was established, however, it could also be protected with force should the king try to reconsolidate his power (by the same right that the Dutch defended their limited sovereignty against the ambitions of their Spanish overlord). Had the rulers of Southeast Asia read Grotius’ work, they might have found a useful warning about the risks of getting entangled with a powerful ally; the readers among the European mercantile class would also see its usefulness.

The natural-right framework of De Jure Belli also empowers parties to a contract to arrive at their own judgments about how to interpret indeterminate clauses (JBP II.XVI) and authorizes any party, public or private, to execute punishment for culpable violations of the law (II.XX). The idea that war-making can be understood as an extension of the right to punish had been part of the Christian just-war tradition from Augustine through Vitoria and Suarez, but Grotius reconceives punishment as a natural right that obtains prior to civil authority (see Tuck 1999 pp. 102f. and Straumann 2006). In circumstances beyond civil jurisdiction, law-respecting persons can take it upon themselves to police and punish crimes affecting society. Because this exercise of power over another assumes a position of superiority, Grotius recognizes the need to explain how this difference in standing can arise among those who are equal by nature. His solution is to point out that violators demote themselves beneath the rest of humanity (JBP II.XX.iii). Anyone who remains in this position of moral superiority can properly execute punishment. The natural right to punish was an important innovation in Grotius’ early De Indis, where he argued that Dutch merchants had legitimate authority to punish the Portuguese for monopolizing the seas (fol. 40). It remains a key feature of his theory of punishment in De Jure Belli, where it provides a further source for just causes to resort to war. In contrast to the anti-imperialist arguments of Vitoria and the school of Salamanca, which had maintained that the princes of Europe had no authority to punish those beyond their jurisdiction except in response to ‘an injury received’ (On the Law of War q.1 a.3; see also On the American Indians q. 2 a.5), Grotius opens the door to punitive war against those who commit ‘crimes against nature.’ Elevated as moral superiors above regimes that enjoin or condone manifestly unjust practices—including cannibalism, piracy, the oppression of their own people or the cruel treatment of foreigners—outside powers may seek to punish these regimes in the interests of human society (II.XX.XL). Adopted while Grotius still had ties to the interests of the Dutch trading companies, this interventionist stance would have expanded the range of justifications available for colonizing lands in both Asia and the Americas (see Tuck 1999 pp. 103-4 and van Ittersum 2010).

At the same time, Grotius shows an awareness, and some discomfort, that his position could be used as a pretext for expansionist wars. He cautions that only violations of universal norms, not of the evolving customs of Europe, count as punishable offenses. Quoting Plutarch, he explicitly warns of the lurking temptations of imperialism: “To wish to impose civilization upon uncivilized peoples is a pretext which may serve to conceal greed for what is another’s” (II.XX.XLI). The structure of Grotius’ position, characteristic of the framework of De Jure Belli, both insists on strict adherence to norms of justice, equity and humanity while still affording the powerful the flexibility to interpret, judge and enforce those norms by their own lights.

4. Natural Right and the Law of Nations

The broadest principles of just war in De Jure Belli ac pacis derive from two sources: the norms of natural justice and the customary law of nations (ius gentium). (Other human and divine laws, importantly, also lay down binding principles for those who have received them, but these sources do not have the universal character of the laws of nature and nations.) On any given question regarding the resort to war or its conduct, both systems of law must be consulted, as each system is capable of influencing the rights and obligations of the other.

a. Obligations from Nature and Custom

The account of natural law in De Jure Belli, heavily influenced by the Stoic notions of Cicero, begins from two universal human concerns: self-preservation and social connection (see JBP I.II.I and Prol. 6-8). The rights of obligations of natural law are all justified in terms of the rational balancing of these two primary concerns. This approach is an outgrowth of Grotius’ earliest work on the laws of war, De Indis, where he argued that the imperative of self-preservation justified two permissions of natural law: to defend one’s life and to acquire possessions (fol. 5’-6). The need for human fellowship justifies two basic obligations towards others: to refrain from inflicting injury and from seizing their possessions (fol. 6’-7’). One apparent change that Grotius makes to his earlier theory regards the basis for these obligations. In De Indis, he aligns himself with a voluntarist account of obligation, found in medieval thinkers such as Ockham, which maintains that natural law is binding upon humans in virtue of the divine will that commands it (fol 5’). The design of nature is one way in which we receive God’s commands. By the time of De Jure Belli, Grotius seems to accept the alternative, intellectualist position that natural law binds us by teaching what both humans and God can recognize as necessary for human life: it shows us not what is obligatory because commanded but what is obligatory or permissible “in itself” (JBP I.I.x). In fact, there is much ambiguity in the later work as to which position Grotius accepts, showing itself even in his very definition of natural law as “a dictate of right reason, which points out that an act has in it a quality of moral baseness of moral necessity; and that, in consequence, such an act is either forbidden or enjoined by the author of nature, God” (JBP I.I.x). This definition is perhaps closest to the ‘mediating’ position more recently advanced by Suárez, maintaining that intellect could recognize what is, in itself, good or bad for humans but that only God’s command makes it obligatory to live accordingly (De Legibus II.VI; see Schneewind 1998 pp. 61 and 74).

What is clear is that Grotius draws a basic distinction in law, following Aristotle, between obligations derived from nature and those derived from an authoritative will (JBP I.I.ix and xiii-xvi). Sources of this second, ‘volitional’ type of law can be divine (as revealed in scripture) or human, and the latter includes not only the laws of particular states but also those laws that nations accept in their relations with each other. Kings and peoples give their assent to the law of nations through custom, not typically by positive agreement. Long observance of a norm in the relations between states gives it the force of law. In contrast to natural law, which confers its basic rights and obligations to all persons whether in a private or public capacity, the law of nations applies to relations between sovereign entities (cf. JBP Prol. 40; De Indis fol. 12ff). It deals, accordingly, largely with matters of state, such as embassies, treaties, and the special privileges of sovereigns in waging war. This system of customary law, in turns out, makes the legal position of sovereigns radically different from that of private actors in the ‘universal society’ established by natural law.

b. Just War: Jus ad Bellum

The mutual influence of the laws of nature and nations can be seen in both the resort to war (traditionally called the jus ad bellum) and in its conduct (jus in bello). The only just grounds for resorting to war are those that involve the pursuit of a right. Among such pursuits, Grotius identifies three kinds: self-defense, the recovery of property and punishment. Each of these has its basis in natural law, though the particular rights at issue might arise from other sources, such as the law of nations. The right of self-defense arises from the natural permission every person has to protect against injury (II.I.iii). If our primary concern is self-preservation, we could not take the risk of living among other people without reserving the permission to protect ourselves from them. The right of defense extends not only to one’s life, but also to one’s body and property. Grotius argues that killing in defense of one’s body is justifiable even if the assailant’s objective is not to kill but to maim or rape ( The reason is that one can never trust that a physical assault will not result in death (though it is unclear in Grotius’ treatment of rape whether it is the victim’s life or interests of men in her ‘chastity’ that is the justifying concern). There are two constraints on justified self-defense: that the attack is imminent and certain (II.I.v). Defense is a just cause that applies only to immediate danger. Even property, however, may be defended with lethal force, with the further constraint that such force is necessary for retaining it (II.I.xvi).

Apart from defense, war may be waged in order to recover one’s rights or to punish the offender. Acting under these just causes will often entail being the one to initiate violence. Grotius argues that this breach of peace is not anti-social (and hence in violation of natural justice) because the initiator is only demanding what the other party already owes (I.II.i.5-6) – they are not violating but upholding the system of rights. Recovery of property applies not only to moveable things and territory, but also to rights over persons (such as rightful subjects or slaves), rights to actions (such as the fulfillment of contracts), and compensation for damages. All of these might be claimed by natural right, though the particular claims might be shaped by prevailing domestic systems of property or by the law of nations. This single heading yields an expansive range of cases in which war is a just option for enforcing rights. Punishment multiplies such cases. When someone willfully violates a right, they become obligated not only to make restitution but to endure punishment equivalent to their crime. Any law-respecting person (as explained above) may execute this punishment, in principle, though a number of factors will tend to limit international punishment. Due to the high risk of harming the innocent in pursuit of the guilty, punitive wars are permissible only for serious crimes (II.XX.xxxviii). In most circumstances, only sovereign governments will be permitted to execute the punishment since individual citizens would have transferred this natural right to their state (see II.XX.xxiv and II.XX.xl; cf. De Indis, fol. 40-40’). Public authorities, therefore, can lay claim to special punitive causes such as the punishment of crimes against natural society (see above) and anticipatory defense. Whereas only an actual attack can justify self-defense, a plot to attack, once set in motion, is already a crime (II.I.xvi). Under the cause of punishment, a state may resort to preemptive warfare which defense alone could not justify. Finally, every exercise of punishment must be limited to the achievement of certain goods. While the right to punish has a retributive justification rooted in the offender’s obligation to endure it, the exercise of this right ought to be governed by consequentialist considerations. The good of the offender, of the victim and of the broader society, are all relevant benefits that need to be weighed against the harms to each of these (II.XX.iv-ix). Especially when the consequences of punishment include a broader war, these considerations may urge clemency, restraint or even pardon (II.XX.xxii-iv and xxxiv-xxxvi; see II.XXIV.ii-iii).

There is a general pattern of argument—that people are permitted, in the strictness of justice, to use violence in a great many cases that will nonetheless call for moderation in the name of humanity and peace—that characterizes the whole of De Jure Belli ac Pacis. Justice is a crucial virtue, as the maintenance of society and respect of law require it, but its guidance is limited to these minimal aims. To know what the laws ought to be and to decide when and how far to exercise one’s rights, it becomes necessary to follow the promptings of equity, humanity and prudence. These “virtues which have as their object the good of others” (I.I.viii) not only serve to measure the proper severity of punishments but also to determine whether war for a punitive cause is warranted at all. Humaneness imposes a moral limit, too, in how far one ought to press rights to property, so as not to use market power to squeeze people (II.XII.xvi) or to withhold vital information when making contracts (II.XII.ix). Even in self-defense, the resort to war can have humanitarian consequences that speak strongly against making full use of one’s right (II.I.iv, viii, ix and xi). It would be a grave error, Grotius warns, to think that “where a right has been adequately established, either war should be waged forthwith, or even that war is permissible in all cases” (II.XXIV.i). The resort to war must be squared not only with justice but with humanitarian concerns, especially for its impact on the lives of innocent people. This loving regard for others that aspires to universality is what Grotius held up, in his works on religion, as the great ethical appeal of the Gospel, and De Jure Belli instructs its readers to recognize that not only humanity but also God calls them to love, forbearance and restraint.

c. Just War: Jus in Bello

The meshing of these normative standards of justice and humanity is especially pronounced in Grotius’ treatment of the conduct of war in Book III of De Jure Belli. The natural law provides but one basic rule for the conduct of war: “things which lead to an end receive their intrinsic value from the end itself” (JBP III.I.ii). That is, if one has a right to resort to war, then one has a right to conduct the war by whatever means are necessary to vindicate the just case. Grotius finds natural justice an unsatisfactory basis for the ethics of combat for two main reasons: (i) it permits inhumane and intemperate actions on the part of those who fight under a just cause, and (ii) it provides no guidance whatsoever for those who fight under an unjust cause. The answer to the first deficiency is Grotius’ account of temperamenta, discussed below. The second deficiency finds its solution in the law of nations. Grotius recognizes that while no war can be naturally just on both sides—a right on one side precludes a right on the other—wars may be either unjust on both sides or justifiably believed to be just on both sides. In either case, there are belligerents for whom natural justice provides no guidance other than, ‘your cause is unjust: stop fighting.’ Grotius resigns himself to the realism that, aside from exceptional cases, most states will not admit to the injustice of their cause and simply stop fighting. The longer such states fight, the more injustices they pile up by resisting the just party. Before long there would be no limit to the punitive war that could be prosecuted against the unjust state (see III.IV.iv). Grotius suggests that nations, recognizing the perils of this situation, established a custom of holding both parties in a war to have equal standing on the battlefield. That is, the law of nations permits to both sides (regardless of the justice of their cause) all the actions that the natural law would permit to the just.

The customs of warfare under the law of nations turn out to be extremely permissive. Tracking the prevailing practice of states, the customs permit everything from the slaughter of innocents to the taking of slaves and the looting of civilian property. License to conduct warfare in this way is the special privilege of sovereigns who have ‘solemnized’ their war under the law of nations. Indifferent to the substantive justice of a state’s cause, the law of nations insists instead on certain formalities—a public declaration by the sovereign authority—to give the belligerent its legal status in a solemn war (I.III.iv and III.III). While Grotius defends this status as a way of restoring normal relations between sovereigns at the end of war, he insists that even kings remain accountable to natural justice. The law of nations is derived from human will, and the license it gives in solemn wars cannot contradict the requirements of natural law. The license amounts to an agreement among nations not to punish each other for certain acts (III.IV.ii-iii). So, after many lengthy chapters detailing the range of actions permitted by the law of nations, Grotius takes an abrupt turn, telling the reader that he must now retrace his steps and “deprive those who wage war of nearly all the privileges which I seemed to grant, yet did not grant to them” (III.X.i). Those waging a solemn war may have the privilege of impunity under human law, but a ‘sense of shame’ ought to instill a respect not only for the ‘external’ judgments of the courts but for the ‘internal’ judgments of conscience (III.X and III.XI.i-ii). Those waging an unjust war will be accountable to God, and they have an (unenforceable) obligation to make restitution to those they have wronged. Even those waging war for a just cause should observe the limits of natural justice by sparing the innocent and pursuing only those war aims that are necessary to securing one’s rights. Conducting war merely within the bounds of the law of nations may obtain impunity, but it brings no badge of honor.

What makes kings and peoples worthy of honor is their observance of temperamenta: moderation and restraint in pursuing their just claims. Such restraint comes out of a respect for justice—by restricting the means of war to only what is necessary to achieving the ends—and also out of a sense of humanity. This humane concern for others seeks to limit the impact of war on the innocent and even those fighting on the opposing side (see, for example, III.XI.viii, XII.viii, and XIII.iv). It requires in many cases the remission of punishment, to forgiveness of burdensome war debts, and a preference for restoring local sovereignty rather than imposing imperial rule. At all events, one must uphold good faith in agreements made with the other side in order to build the basis for normal relations after the war (III.XXI-XXV). Humanity holds in view not only the aim of restoring rights but of restoring peace (see III.XXV.ii-iii). Justice might condone war against injuries that threaten the basis for living together in society, but a sense of humanity is fostered by the recognition that we must live together again.

5. Scholarly Interest in Grotius

In the century following his death, Grotius’ works came to be viewed as pivotal in the development of early modern moral and political philosophy. Jean Barbeyrac, in his 1749 essay on the emerging Science of Morality, described Grotius as “breaking the ice” of medieval dogma to make way for a rational approach to ethics. The natural law philosophy of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries—from Pufendorf to Locke, Vattel and Thomasius—took the framework of De Jure Belli ac pacis as a point of departure. This canonical status made Grotius required reading for Enlightenment intellectuals, such that Rousseau would come to describe him in Emile, however critically, as “the master of all the savants” and Adam Smith would credit him in his lectures on jurisprudence as giving the world the most systematic treatment of the subject to date. The 21st century has seen a renewed debate among scholars over the extent of Grotius ‘originality’ in moral thought and in what it consists: the purported secularism of his approach, its rationalism, its refutation of skepticism, its account of obligation, or a variety of other candidates. Beyond these disputes, recent historians of moral and political philosophy have taken special interest in Grotius’ conception of natural rights, his theory of punishment, and his accounts of property and state sovereignty.

Grotius’ legacy, however, is most strongly connected to his contributions to international legal theory and the laws of war. Interest in Grotius saw a revival in the late nineteenth century amid efforts to articulate and institutionalize norms of international law. The peace societies of the time, closely bound up with the international women’s suffrage movement, traced back to the Grotius the evolving conscience of the ‘civilized’ world towards justice and mercy in international conflicts. Andrew Dickson White, the U.S. delegate to the 1899 Hague Peace Conference, regarded Grotius—whom he classed among the world’s Seven Great Statesmen in the Warfare of Humanity with Unreason—as providing the “real foundation of the modern science of international law.” While the claim to being ‘father’ of this law was as disputed as it was common, and despite many critical views of this work—in his 1925 history of political philosophy, Charles Vaughan had called De Jure Belli a “nest of sophistries and contradictions”—Grotius came to have a canonical status in international legal thought. By the end of the Second World War, the legal scholar Hersch Lauterpacht was able to discern a ‘Grotian tradition in international law’ rooted in commitments to the rule of law, to norms beyond positive law, and to the human capacity for moral progress in the law. Grotius continues to be most widely known within the study of just war theory and international law, most notably for the contribution of Mare Liberum to the modern law of the sea.

The preeminence of Grotius in the field of international law exerted its influence as well on the development of international relations theory. Theorists of international relations have commonly viewed Grotius as providing a distinctive conception of international society that provides a middle way between Hobbesian anarchy and Kantian cosmopolitanism. In this schema of ‘realist,’ ‘rationalist,’ and ‘revolutionist’ theories, proposed by Martin Wight and pursued in the work of Hedley Bull and others of the ‘English School’ of international relations theory, the Grotian tradition provides a rationalist account of international society. While rejecting the idea that there are common interests among states sufficient to underpin a supranational authority, the Grotian system identifies a ‘solidarity’ of interests around basic principles of order (such as mutual independence, adherence to promises, the limitation of war) that enables sovereign states to constitute their relations as a (limited) community rather than as a contest governed by the dynamics of power alone.  The association of Grotius with this strain of thought has given his work enduring interest in contemporary international theory.

While reaching the greatest prominence in international thought, the early 21st century scholarship on Grotius has a markedly interdisciplinary character. His works have received considerable attention from political theorists and historians of political thought, as well as by those studying his contributions to moral philosophy, theology and literature. Indeed, the eclecticism of Grotius’ thought pushes beyond modern disciplinary boundaries and springs up continuing dialogues across fields and borders.

6. References and Further Reading

Included in the Primary Sources are selected works of Grotius with a preference for most recently in-print English editions. (Note: references to De Jure Belli in the article provide the book, chapter and section numbers, e.g., II.XXIV.i.). The selected secondary sources include references from the article as well as suggested directions for further reading. The interested scholar will also want to consult the regularly published journal of Grotius studies, Grotiana.

a. Primary Sources

  • Grotius, H. (2006). De Jure Praedae Commentarius / Commentary on the law of prize and booty. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1994). "Commentarius in Theses XI": an Early Treatise on Sovereignty, the Just war, and the Legitimacy of the Dutch Revolt, P. Lang.
  • Grotius, H. (2004). The Free Sea. Indianapolis, IN, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1988). Meletius. Leiden, Netherlands, Brill.
  • Grotius, H. (1990). Defensio Fidei Catholicae de Satisfactione Christi, adversus Faustum Socinum Senensem. Assen/Maastricht, the Netherlands, Van Gorcum.
  • Grotius, H. (2001). De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa Sacra. Studies in the history of Christian thought, v. 102. H.-J. v. Dam. Leiden, Brill.
  • Grotius, H. (1926). The Jurisprudence of Holland. R. W. Lee. Oxford, Clarendon Press.
  • Grotius, H. (2005). The rights of war and peace. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1962). De Jure Belli ac pacis libri tres / The Law of War and Peace. Indianapolis, Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Grotius, H. (2012). The Truth of the Christian Religion. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Borschberg, P. (1994). “Critical Introduction.” "Commentarius in Theses XI": an Early Treatise on Sovereignty, the Just War, and the Legitimacy of the Dutch Revolt. H. Grotius, P. Lang.
  • Brett, A. (2002). "Natural Right and Civil Community: The Civil Philosophy of Hugo Grotius." The Historical Journal 45(01): 31-51.
  • Bull, H., B. Kingsbury, et al. (1990). Hugo Grotius and International Relations. New York, Clarendon Press.
  • Dumbauld, E. (1969). The Life and Legal Writings of Hugo Grotius. Norman, University of Oklahoma Press.
  • Forde, S. (1998). "Hugo Grotius on Ethics and War." American Political Science Review 92(3): 639-648.
  • Haakonssen, K. (1985). "Hugo Grotius and the History of Political Thought." Political Theory 13(2): 239-265.
  • Heering, J. (2004). “Hugo Grotius' De Veritate Religionis Christianae.” Hugo Grotius as Apologist for the Christian Religion: a Study of his Work De veritate Religionis Christianae, 1640. J. Heering. Leiden, Brill: 41-52.
  • Keene, E. (2002). Beyond the Anarchical Society: Grotius, Colonialism and Order in World Politics, Cambridge University Press.
  • Kinsella, H. M. (2006). "Gendering Grotius: Sex and Sex Difference in the Laws of War." Political Theory 34(2): 161.
  • Meijer, J. (1955). "Hugo Grotius' "Remonstrantie"." Jewish Social Studies 17(2): 91-104.
  • Nellen, H. a. R. E., Ed. (1994). Hugo Grotius Theologian: Essays in Honor of G.H.M. Posthumus Meyjes. New York, Brill.
  • Onuma, Y., Ed. (1993). A Normative Approach to War: Peace, War, and Justice in Hugo Grotius. Oxford, Clarendon Press.
  • Schneewind, J. B. (1998). The Invention of Autonomy: A History of Modern Moral Philosophy. New York, Cambridge University Press, ch. 4.
  • Straumann, B. (2006). "The Right to Punish as a Just Cause of War in Hugo Grotius' Natural Law." Studies in the History of Ethics.
  • Suárez, F. (1944). De Legibus. Selections from Three Works. New York: Clarendon Press.
  • Thomson, E. (2009). "The Dutch Miracle, Modified. Hugo Grotius's Mare Liberum, Commercial Governance and Imperial War in the Early-Seventeenth Century." Grotiana 30(1): 107-130.
  • Tuck, R. (1993). Philosophy and Government, 1572-1651. New York, Cambridge University Press, ch. 5.
  • Tuck, R. (1999). The Rights of War and Peace : Political Thought and the International Order from Grotius to Kant. New York, Oxford University Press, ch. 3.
  • van Gelderen, M. (1993). “Vitoria, Grotius and Human Rights: The Early Experience of Colonialism in Spanish and Dutch Political Thought.” Human Rights and Cultural Diversity. W. Schmale. Goldbach, Germany, Keip Publishing: 215-238.
  • van Gelderen, M. (2006). 'So Meerly Humane': Theories of Resistance in Early-Modern Europe. Rethinking the Foundations of Modern Political Thought. A. S. Brett, J. Tully and H. Hamilton-Bleakley. New York, Cambridge University Press: 149-170.
  • van Ittersum, M. J. (2006). Profit and Principle : Hugo Grotius, Natural Rights Theories and the Rise of Dutch Power in the East Indies, 1595-1615. Leiden, Brill.
  • van Ittersum, M. J. (2010). "The Long Goodbye: Hugo Grotius' Lustification of Dutch Expansion Overseas, 1615-1645." History of European Ideas 36: 386-411.
  • Vitoria, F. d. (1991). On the American Indians. Political writings. A. L. J. Pagden. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Vitoria, F. d. (1991). On the Law of War. Political writings. A. L. J. Pagden. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Vreeland, H. (1917). Hugo Grotius, the Father of the Modern Science of International Law. New York, Oxford University Press.
  • Wilson, E. M. (2008). The Savage Republic: De Indis of Hugo Grotius, Republicanism, and Dutch Hegemony within the Early Modern World-System (c. 1600-1619), Martinus Nijhoff Publishers.


Author Information

Andrew Blom
Central Michigan University
U. S. A.

Gottfried Leibniz: Philosophy of Mind

LeibnizGottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) was a true polymath: he made substantial contributions to a host of different fields such as mathematics, law, physics, theology, and most subfields of philosophy.  Within the philosophy of mind, his chief innovations include his rejection of the Cartesian doctrines that all mental states are conscious and that non-human animals lack souls as well as sensation.  Leibniz’s belief that non-rational animals have souls and feelings prompted him to reflect much more thoroughly than many of his predecessors on the mental capacities that distinguish human beings from lower animals.  Relatedly, the acknowledgment of unconscious mental representations and motivations enabled Leibniz to provide a far more sophisticated account of human psychology.  It also led Leibniz to hold that perception—rather than consciousness, as Cartesians assume—is the distinguishing mark of mentality.

The capacities that make human minds superior to animal souls, according to Leibniz, include not only their capacity for more elevated types of perceptions or mental representations, but also their capacity for more elevated types of appetitions or mental tendencies.  Self-consciousness and abstract thought are examples of perceptions that are exclusive to rational souls, while reasoning and the tendency to do what one judges to be best overall are examples of appetitions of which only rational souls are capable.  The mental capacity for acting freely is another feature that sets human beings apart from animals and it in fact presupposes the capacity for elevated kinds of perceptions as well as appetitions.

Another crucial contribution to the philosophy of mind is Leibniz’s frequently cited mill argument.  This argument is supposed to show, through a thought experiment that involves walking into a mill, that material things such as machines or brains cannot possibly have mental states.  Only immaterial things, that is, soul-like entities, are able to think or perceive.  If this argument succeeds, it shows not only that our minds must be immaterial or that we must have souls, but also that we will never be able to construct a computer that can truly think or perceive.

Finally, Leibniz’s doctrine of pre-established harmony also marks an important innovation in the history of the philosophy of mind.  Like occasionalists, Leibniz denies any genuine interaction between body and soul.  He agrees with them that the fact that my foot moves when I decide to move it, as well as the fact that I feel pain when my body gets injured, cannot be explained by a genuine causal influence of my soul on my body, or of my body on my soul.  Yet, unlike occasionalists, Leibniz also rejects the idea that God continually intervenes in order to produce the correspondence between my soul and my body.  That, Leibniz thinks, would be unworthy of God.  Instead, God has created my soul and my body in such a way that they naturally correspond to each other, without any interaction or divine intervention.  My foot moves when I decide to move it because this motion has been programmed into it from the very beginning.  Likewise, I feel pain when my body is injured because this pain was programmed into my soul.  The harmony or correspondence between mental states and states of the body is therefore pre-established.

Table of Contents

  1. Leibnizian Minds and Mental States
    1. Perceptions
      1. Consciousness, Apperception, and Reflection
      2. Abstract Thought, Concepts, and Universal Truths
    2. Appetitions
  2. Freedom
  3. The Mill Argument
  4. The Relation between Mind and Body
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources in English Translation
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Leibnizian Minds and Mental States

Leibniz is a panpsychist: he believes that everything, including plants and inanimate objects, has a mind or something analogous to a mind.  More specifically, he holds that in all things there are simple, immaterial, mind-like substances that perceive the world around them.  Leibniz calls these mind-like substances ‘monads.’  While all monads have perceptions, however, only some of them are aware of what they perceive, that is, only some of them possess sensation or consciousness.  Even fewer monads are capable of self-consciousness and rational perceptions.  Leibniz typically refers to monads that are capable of sensation or consciousness as ‘souls,’ and to those that are also capable of self-consciousness and rational perceptions as ‘minds.’  The monads in plants, for instance, lack all sensation and consciousness and are hence neither souls nor minds; Leibniz sometimes calls this least perfect type of monad a ‘bare monad’ and compares the mental states of such monads to our states when we are in a stupor or a dreamless sleep.  Animals, on the other hand, can sense and be conscious, and thus possess souls (see Animal Minds).  God and the souls of human beings and angels, finally, are examples of minds because they are self-conscious and rational.  As a result, even though there are mind-like things everywhere for Leibniz, minds in the stricter sense are not ubiquitous.

All monads, even those that lack consciousness altogether, have two basic types of mental states: perceptions, that is, representations of the world around them, and appetitions, or tendencies to transition from one representation to another.  Hence, even though monads are similar to the minds or souls described by Descartes in some ways—after all, they are immaterial substances—consciousness is not an essential property of monads, while it is an essential property of Cartesian souls.  For Leibniz, then, the distinguishing mark of mentality is perception, rather than consciousness (see Simmons 2001).  In fact, even Leibnizian minds in the stricter sense, that is, monads capable of self-consciousness and reasoning, are quite different from the minds in Descartes’s system.  While Cartesian minds are conscious of all their mental states, Leibnizian minds are conscious only of a small portion of their states.  To us it may seem obvious that there is a host of unconscious states in our minds, but in the seventeenth century this was a radical and novel notion.  This profound departure from Cartesian psychology allows Leibniz to paint a much more nuanced picture of the human mind.

One crucial aspect of Leibniz’s panpsychism is that in addition to the rational monad that is the soul of a human being, there are non-rational, bare monads everywhere in the human being’s body.  Leibniz sometimes refers to the soul of a human being or animal as the central or dominant monad of the organism.  The bare monads that are in an animal’s body, accordingly, are subordinate to its dominant monad or soul.  Even plants, for Leibniz, have central or dominant monads, but because they lack sensation, these dominant monads cannot strictly speaking be called souls.  They are merely bare monads, like the monads that are subordinate to them.

The claim that there are mind-like things everywhere in nature—in our bodies, in plants, and even in inanimate objects—strikes many readers of Leibniz as ludicrous.  Yet, Leibniz thinks he has conclusive metaphysical arguments for this claim.  Very roughly, he holds that a complex, divisible thing such as a body can only be real if it is made up of parts that are real.  If the parts in turn have parts, those have to be real as well.  The problem is, Leibniz claims, that matter is infinitely divisible: we can never reach parts that do not themselves have parts.  Even if there were material atoms that we cannot actually divide, they must still be spatially extended, like all matter, and therefore have spatial parts.  If something is spatially extended, after all, we can at least in thought distinguish its left half from its right half, no matter how small it is.  As a result, Leibniz thinks, purely material things are not real.  The reality of complex wholes depends on the reality of their parts, but with purely material things, we never get to parts that are real since we never reach an end in this quest for reality.  Leibniz concludes that there must be something in nature that is not material and not divisible, and from which all things derive their reality.  These immaterial, indivisible things just are monads.  Because of the role they play, Leibniz sometimes describes them as “atoms of substance, that is, real unities absolutely destitute of parts, […] the first absolute principles of the composition of things, and, as it were, the final elements in the analysis of substantial things”  (p. 142.  For a more thorough description of monads, see Leibniz: Metaphysics, as well as the Monadology and the New System of Nature, both included in Ariew and Garber.)

a. Perceptions

As already seen, all monads have perceptions, that is, they represent the world around them.  Yet, not all perceptions—not even all the perceptions of minds—are conscious.  In fact, Leibniz holds that at any given time a mind has infinitely many perceptions, but is conscious only of a very small number of them.  Even souls and bare monads have an infinity of perceptions.  This is because Leibniz believes, for reasons that need not concern us here (but see Leibniz: Metaphysics), that each monad constantly perceives the entire universe.  For instance, even though I am not aware of it at all, my mind is currently representing every single grain of sand on Mars.  Even the monads in my little toe, as well as the monads in the apple I am about to eat, represent those grains of sand.

Leibniz often describes perceptions of things of which the subject is unaware and which are far removed from the subject’s body as ‘confused.’  He is fond of using the sound of the ocean as a metaphor for this kind of confusion: when I go to the beach, I do not hear the sound of each individual wave distinctly; instead, I hear a roaring sound from which I am unable to discern the sounds of the individual waves (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 13, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  None of these individual sounds stands out.  Leibniz claims that confused perceptions in monads are analogous to this confusion of sounds, except of course for the fact that monads do not have to be aware even of the confused whole.  To the extent that a perception does stand out from the rest, however, Leibniz calls it ‘distinct.’  This distinctness comes in degrees, and Leibniz claims that the central monads of organisms always perceive their own bodies more distinctly than they perceive other bodies.

Bare monads are not capable of very distinct perceptions; their perceptual states are always muddled and confused to a high degree.  Animal souls, on the other hand, can have much more distinct perceptions than bare monads.  This is in part because they possess sense organs, such as eyes, which allow them to bundle and condense information about their surroundings (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 4).  The resulting perceptions are so distinct that the animals can remember them later, and Leibniz calls this kind of perception ‘sensation.’  The ability to remember prior perceptions is extremely useful, as a matter of fact, because it enables animals to learn from experience.  For instance, a dog that remembers being beaten with a stick can learn to avoid sticks in the future (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  Sensations are also tied to pleasure and pain: when an animal distinctly perceives some imperfection in its body, such as a bruise, this perception just is a feeling of pain.  Similarly, when an animal perceives some perfection of its body, such as nourishment, this perception is pleasure.  Unlike Descartes, then, Leibniz believed that animals are capable of feeling pleasure and pain.

Consequently, souls differ from bare monads in part through the distinctness of their perceptions: unlike bare monads, souls can have perceptions that are distinct enough to give rise to memory and sensation, and they can feel pleasure and pain.  Rational souls, or minds, share these capacities.  Yet they are additionally capable of perceptions of an even higher level.  Unlike the souls of lower animals, they can reflect on their own mental states, think abstractly, and acquire knowledge of necessary truths.  For instance, they are capable of understanding mathematical concepts and proofs.  Moreover, they can think of themselves as substances and subjects: they have the ability to use and understand the word ‘I’ (see Monadology, section 30).  These kinds of perceptions, for Leibniz, are distinctively rational perceptions, and they are exclusive to minds or rational souls.

It is clear, then, that there are different types of perceptions: some are unconscious, some are conscious, and some constitute reflection or abstract thought.  What exactly distinguishes these types of perceptions, however, is a complicated question that warrants a more detailed investigation.

i. Consciousness, Apperception, and Reflection

Why are some perceptions conscious, while others are not?  In one text, Leibniz explains the difference as follows: “it is good to distinguish between perception, which is the internal state of the monad representing external things, and apperception, which is consciousness, or the reflective knowledge of this internal state, something not given to all souls, nor at all times to a given soul” (Principles of Nature and Grace, section 4).  This passage is interesting for several reasons: Leibniz not only equates consciousness with what he calls ‘apperception,’ and states that only some monads possess it.  He also seems to claim that conscious perceptions differ from other perceptions in virtue of having different types of things as their objects: while unconscious perceptions represent external things, apperception or consciousness has perceptions, that is, internal things, as its object.  Consciousness is therefore closely connected to reflection, as the term ‘reflective knowledge’ also makes clear.

The passage furthermore suggests that Leibniz understands consciousness in terms of higher-order mental states because it says that in order to be conscious of a perception, I must possess “reflective knowledge” of that perception.  One way of interpreting this statement is to understand these higher-order mental states as higher-order perceptions: in order to be conscious of a first-order perception, I must additionally possess a second-order perception of that first-order perception.  For example, in order to be conscious of the glass of water in front of me, I must not only perceive the glass of water, but I must also perceive my perception of the glass of water.  After all, in the passage under discussion, Leibniz defines ‘consciousness’ or ‘apperception’ as the reflective knowledge of a perception.  Such higher-order theories of consciousness are still endorsed by some philosophers of mind today (see Consciousness).  For an alternative interpretation of Leibniz’s theory of consciousness, however, see Jorgensen 2009, 2011a, and 2011b).

There is excellent textual evidence that according to Leibniz, consciousness or apperception is not limited to minds, but is instead shared by animal souls.  One passage in which Leibniz explicitly ascribes apperception to animals is from the New Essays: “beasts have no understanding … although they have the faculty for apperceiving the more conspicuous and outstanding impressions—as when a wild boar apperceives someone who is shouting at it” (p. 173).  Moreover, Leibniz sometimes claims that sensation involves apperception (e.g. New Essays p. 161; p. 188), and since animals are clearly capable of sensation, they must thus possess some form of apperception.  Hence, it seems that Leibniz ascribes apperception to animals, which in turn he elsewhere identifies with consciousness.

Yet, the textual evidence for animal consciousness is unfortunately anything but neat because in the New Essays—that is, in the very same text—Leibniz also suggests that there is an important difference between animals and human beings somewhere in this neighborhood.  In several passages, he says that any creature with consciousness has a moral or personal identity, which in turn is something he grants only to minds.  He states, for instance, that “consciousness or the sense of I proves moral or personal identity” (New Essays, p. 236).  Hence, it seems clear that for Leibniz there is something in the vicinity of consciousness that animals lack and that minds possess, and which is crucial for morality.

A promising solution to this interpretive puzzle is the following: what animals lack is not consciousness generally, but only a particular type of consciousness.  More specifically, while they are capable of consciously perceiving external things, they lack awareness, or at least a particular type of awareness, of the self.  In the Monadology, for instance, Leibniz argues that knowledge of necessary truths distinguishes us from animals and that through this knowledge “we rise to reflexive acts, which enable us to think of that which is called ‘I’ and enable us to consider that this or that is in us” (sections 29-30).  Similarly, he writes in the Principles of Nature and Grace that “minds … are capable of performing reflective acts, and capable of considering what is called ‘I’, substance, soul, mind—in brief, immaterial things and immaterial truths” (section 5).  Self-knowledge, or self-consciousness, then, appears to be exclusive to rational souls.  Leibniz moreover connects this consciousness of the self to personhood and moral responsibility in several texts, such as for instance in the Theodicy: “In saying that the soul of man is immortal one implies the subsistence of what makes the identity of the person, something which retains its moral qualities, conserving the consciousness, or the reflective inward feeling, of what it is: thus it is rendered susceptible to chastisement or reward” (section 89).

Based on these passages, it seems that one crucial cognitive difference between human beings and animals is that even though animals possess the kind of apperception that is involved in sensation and in an acute awareness of external objects, they lack a certain type of apperception or consciousness, namely reflective self-knowledge or self-consciousness.  Especially because of the moral implications of this kind of consciousness that Leibniz posits, this difference is clearly an extremely important one.  According to these texts, then, it is not consciousness or apperception tout court that distinguishes minds from animal souls, but rather a particular kind of apperception.  What animals are incapable of, according to Leibniz, is self-knowledge or self-awareness, that is, an awareness not only of their perceptions, but also of the self that is having those perceptions.

Because Leibniz associates consciousness so closely with reflection, one might wonder whether the fact that animals are capable of conscious perceptions implies that they are also capable of reflection.  This is another difficult interpretive question because there appears to be evidence both for a positive and for a negative answer.  Reflection, according to Leibniz, is “nothing but attention to what is within us” (New Essays, p. 51).  Moreover, as already seen, he argues that reflective acts enable us “to think of that which is called ‘I’ and … to consider that this or that is in us” (Monadology, section 30).  Leibniz does not appear to ascribe reflection to animals explicitly, and in fact, there are several texts in which he says in no uncertain terms that they lack reflection altogether.  He states for instance that “the soul of a beast has no more reflection than an atom” (Loemker, p. 588).  Likewise, he defines ‘intellection’ as “a distinct perception combined with a faculty of reflection, which the beasts do not have” (New Essays, p. 173) and explains that “just as there are two sorts of perception, one simple, the other accompanied by reflections that give rise to knowledge and reasoning, so there are two kinds of souls, namely ordinary souls, whose perception is without reflection, and rational souls, which think about what they do” (Strickland, p. 84).

On the other hand, as seen, Leibniz does ascribe apperception or consciousness to animals, and consciousness in turn appears to involve higher-order mental states.  This suggests that Leibnizian animals must perceive or know their own perceptions when they are conscious of something, and that in turn seems to imply that they can reflect after all.  A closely related reason for ascribing reflection to animals is that Leibniz sometimes explicitly associates reflection with apperception or consciousness.  In a passage already quoted above, for instance, Leibniz defines ‘consciousness’ as the reflective knowledge of a first-order perception.  Hence, if animals possess consciousness it seems that they must also have some type of reflection.

We are consequently faced with an interpretive puzzle: even though there is strong indirect evidence that Leibniz attributes reflection to animals, there is also direct evidence against it.  There are at least two ways of solving this puzzle.  In order to make sense of passages in which Leibniz restricts reflection to rational souls, one can either deny that perceiving one’s internal states is sufficient for reflection, or one can distinguish between different types of reflection, in such a way that the most demanding type of reflection is limited to minds.  One good way to deny that perception of one’s internal states is sufficient for reflection is to point out that Leibniz defines reflection as “attention to what is within us” (New Essays, p. 51), rather than as ‘perception of what is within us.’  Attention to internal states, arguably, is more demanding than mere perception of these states, and animals may well be incapable of the former.  Attention might be a particularly distinct perception, for instance.  Alternatively, one can argue that reflection requires a self-concept, or self-knowledge, which also goes beyond the mere perception of internal states and may be inaccessible to animals.  Perceiving my internal states, on that interpretation, amounts to reflection only if I also possess knowledge of the self that is having those states.  Instead of denying that perceiving one’s own states is sufficient for reflection, one can also distinguish different types of reflection and claim that while the mere perception of one’s internal states is a type of reflection, there is a more demanding type of reflection that requires attention, a self-concept, or something similar.  Yet, the difference between those two responses appears to be merely terminological.  Based on the textual evidence discussed above, it is clear that either reflection generally, or at least a particular type of reflection, must be exclusive to minds.

ii. Abstract Thought, Concepts, and Universal Truths

So far, we have seen that one cognitive capacity that elevates minds above animal souls is self-consciousness, which is a particular type of reflection.  Before turning to appetitions, we should briefly investigate three additional, mutually related, cognitive abilities that only minds possess, namely the abilities to abstract, to form or possess concepts, and to know general truths.  In what may well be Leibniz’s most intriguing discussion of abstraction, he says that some non-human animals “apparently recognize whiteness, and observe it in chalk as in snow; but it does not amount to abstraction, which requires attention to the general apart from the particular, and consequently involves knowledge of universal truths which beasts do not possess” (New Essays, p. 142).  In this passage, we learn not only that beasts are incapable of abstraction, but also that abstraction involves “attention to the general apart from the particular” as well as “knowledge of universal truths.”  Hence, abstraction for Leibniz seems to consist in separating out one part of a complex idea and focusing on it exclusively.  Instead of thinking of different white things, one must think of whiteness in general, abstracting away from the particular instances of whiteness.  In order to think about whiteness in the abstract, then, it is not enough to perceive different white things as similar to one another.

Yet, it might still seem mysterious how precisely animals should be able to observe whiteness in different objects if they are unable to abstract.  One fact that makes this less mysterious, however, is that, on Leibniz’s view, while animals are unable to pay attention to whiteness in general, the idea of whiteness may nevertheless play a role in their recognition of whiteness.  As Leibniz explains in the New Essays, even though human minds are aware of complex ideas and particular truths first as well as rather easily, and have to expend a lot of effort to subsequently achieve awareness of simple ideas and general principles, the order of nature is the other way around:

The truths that we start by being aware of are indeed particular ones, just as we start with the coarsest and most composite ideas.  But that doesn’t alter the fact that in the order of nature the simplest comes first, and that the reasons for particular truths rest wholly on the more general ones of which they are mere instances. … The mind relies on these principles constantly; but it does not find it so easy to sort them out and to command a distinct view of each of them separately, for that requires great attention to what it is doing. (p. 83f.)

Here, Leibniz says that minds can rely on general principles, or abstract ideas, without being aware of them, and without having distinct perceptions of them separately.  This might help us to explain how animals can observe whiteness in different white objects without being able to abstract: the simple idea of whiteness might play a role in their cognition, even though they are not aware of it, and are unable to pay attention to this idea.

The passage just quoted is interesting for another reason: It shows that abstracting and achieving knowledge of general truths have a lot in common and presuppose the capacity to reflect.  It takes a special effort of mind to become aware of abstract ideas and general truths, that is, to separate these out from complex ideas and particular truths.  It is this special effort, it seems, of which animals are incapable; while they can at times achieve relatively distinct perceptions of complex or particular things, they lack the ability to pay attention, or at least sufficient attention, to their internal states.  At least part of the reason for their inability to abstract and to know general truths, then, appears to be their inability, or at least very limited ability, to reflect.

Abstraction also seems closely related to the possession or formation of concepts: arguably, what a mind gains when abstracting the idea of whiteness from the complex ideas of particular white things is what we would call a concept of whiteness.  Hence, since animals cannot abstract, they do not possess such concepts.  They may nevertheless, as suggested above, have confused ideas such as a confused idea of whiteness that allows them to recognize whiteness in different white things, without enabling them to pay attention to whiteness in the abstract.

An interesting question that arises in this context is the question whether having an idea of the future or thinking about a future state requires abstraction.  One reason to think so is that, plausibly, in order to think about the future, for instance about future pleasures or pains, one needs to abstract from the present pleasures or pains that one can directly experience, or from past pleasures and pains that one remembers.  After all, just as one can only attain the concept of whiteness by abstracting from other properties of the particular white things one has experienced, so, arguably, one can only acquire the idea of future pleasures through abstraction from particular present pleasures.  It may be for this reason that Leibniz sometimes notes that animals have “neither foresight nor anxiety for the future” (Huggard, p. 414).  Apparently, he does not consider animals capable of having an idea of the future or of future states.

Leibniz thinks that in addition to sensible concepts such as whiteness, we also have concepts that are not derived from the senses, that is, we possess intellectual concepts.  The latter, it seems, set us apart even farther from animals because we attain them through reflective self-awareness, of which animals, as seen above, are not capable.  Leibniz says, for instance, that “being is innate in us—the knowledge of being is comprised in the knowledge that we have of ourselves.  Something like this holds of other general notions” (New Essays, p. 102).  Similarly, he states a few pages later that “reflection enables us to find the idea of substance within ourselves, who are substances” (New Essays, p. 105).  Many similar statements can be found elsewhere.  The intellectual concepts that we can discover in our souls, according to Leibniz, include not only being and substance, but also unity, similarity, sameness, pleasure, cause, perception, action, duration, doubting, willing, and reasoning, to name only a few.  In order to derive these concepts from our reflective self-awareness, we must apparently engage in abstraction: I am distinctly aware of myself as an agent, a substance, and a perceiver, for instance, and from this awareness I can abstract the ideas of action, substance, and perception in general.  This means that animals are inferior to us among other things in the following two ways: they cannot have distinct self-awareness, and they cannot abstract.  They would need both of these capacities in order to form intellectual concepts, and they would need the latter—that is, abstraction—in order to form sensible concepts.

Intellectual concepts are not the only things that minds can find in themselves: in addition, they are also able to discover eternal or general truths there, such as the axioms or principles of logic, metaphysics, ethics, and natural theology.  Like the intellectual concepts just mentioned, these general truths or principles cannot be derived from the senses and can thus be classified as innate ideas.  Leibniz says, for instance,

Above all, we find [in this I and in the understanding] the force of the conclusions of reasoning, which are part of what is called the natural light. … It is also by this natural light that the axioms of mathematics are recognized. … [I]t is generally true that we know [necessary truths] only by this natural light, and not at all by the experiences of the senses. (Ariew and Garber, p. 189)

Axioms and general principles, according to this passage, must come from the mind itself and cannot be acquired through sense experience.  Yet, also as in the case of intellectual concepts, it is not easy for us to discover such general truths or principles in ourselves; instead, it takes effort or special attention.  It again appears to require the kind of attention to what is within us of which animals are not capable.  Because they lack this type of reflection, animals are “governed purely by examples from the senses” and “consequently can never arrive at necessary and general truths” (Strickland p. 84).

b. Appetitions

Monads possess not only perceptions, or representations of the world they inhabit, but also appetitions.  These appetitions are the tendencies or inclinations of these monads to act, that is, to transition from one mental state to another.  The most familiar examples of appetitions are conscious desires, such as my desire to have a drink of water.  Having this desire means that I have some tendency to drink from the glass of water in front of me.  If the desire is strong enough, and if there are no contrary tendencies or desires in my mind that are stronger—for instance, the desire to win the bet that I can refrain from drinking water for one hour—I will attempt to drink the water.  This desire for water is one example of a Leibnizian appetition.  Yet, just as in the case of perceptions, only a very small portion of appetitions is conscious.  We are unaware of most of the tendencies that lead to changes in our perceptions.  For instance, I am aware neither of perceiving my hair growing, nor of my tendencies to have those perceptions.  Moreover, as in the case of perceptions, there are an infinite number of appetitions in any monad at any given time.  This is because, as seen, each monad represents the entire universe.  As a result, each monad constantly transitions from one infinitely complex perceptual state to another, reflecting all changes that take place in the universe.  The tendency that leads to a monad’s transition from one of these infinitely complex perceptual states to another is therefore also infinitely complex, or composed of infinitely many smaller appetitions.

The three types of monads—bare monads, souls, and minds—differ not only with respect to their perceptual or cognitive capacities, but also with respect to their appetitive capacities.  In fact, there are good reasons to think that three different types of appetitions correspond to the three types of perceptions mentioned above, that is, to perception, sensation, and rational perception.  After all, Leibniz distinguishes between appetitions of which we can be aware and those of which we cannot be aware, which he sometimes also calls ‘insensible appetitions’ or ‘insensible inclinations.’  He appears to further divide the type of which we can be aware into rational and non-rational appetitions.  This threefold division is made explicit in a passage from the New Essays:

There are insensible inclinations of which we are not aware.  There are sensible ones: we are acquainted with their existence and their objects, but have no sense of how they are constituted. … Finally there are distinct inclinations which reason gives us: we have a sense both of their strength and of their constitution. (p. 194)

According to this passage, then, Leibniz acknowledges the following three types of appetitions: (a) insensible or unconscious appetitions, (b) sensible or conscious appetitions, and (c) distinct or rational appetitions.

Even though Leibniz does not say so explicitly, he furthermore believes that bare monads have only unconscious appetitions, that animal souls additionally have conscious appetitions, and that only minds have distinct or rational appetitions.  Unconscious appetitions are tendencies such as the one that leads to my perception of my hair growing, or the one that prompts me unexpectedly to perceive the sound of my alarm in the morning.  All appetitions in bare monads are of this type; they are not aware of any of their tendencies.  An example of a sensible appetition, on the other hand, is an appetition for pleasure.  My desire for a piece of chocolate, for instance, is such an appetition: I am aware that I have this desire and I know what the object of the desire is, but I do not fully understand why I have it.  Animals are capable of this kind of appetition; in fact, many of their actions are motivated by their appetitions for pleasure.  Finally, an example of a rational appetition is the appetition for something that my intellect has judged to be the best course of action.  Leibniz appears to identify the capacity for this kind of appetition with the will, which, as we will see below, plays a crucial role in Leibniz’s theory of freedom.  What is distinctive of this kind of appetition is that whenever we possess it, we are not only aware of it and of its object, but also understand why we have it.  For instance, if I judge that I ought to call my mother and consequently desire to call her, Leibniz thinks, I am aware of the thought process that led me to make this judgment, and hence of the origins of my desire.

Another type of rational appetition is the type of appetition involved in reasoning.  As seen, Leibniz thinks that animals, because they can remember prior perceptions, are able to learn from experience, like the dog that learns to run away from sticks.  This sort of behavior, which involves a kind of inductive inference (see Deductive and Inductive Arguments), can be called a “shadow of reasoning,” Leibniz tells us (New Essays, p. 50).  Yet, animals are incapable of true—that is, presumably, deductive—reasoning, which, Leibniz tells us, “depends on necessary or eternal truths, such as those of logic, numbers, and geometry, which bring about an indubitable connection of ideas and infallible consequences” (Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  Only minds can reason in this stricter sense.

Some interpreters think that reasoning consists simply in very distinct perception.  Yet that cannot be the whole story.  First of all, reasoning must involve a special type of perception that differs from the perceptions of lower animals in kind, rather than merely in degree, namely abstract thought and the perception of eternal truths.  This kind of perception is not just more distinct; it has entirely different objects than the perceptions of non-rational souls, as we saw above.  Moreover, it seems more accurate to describe reasoning as a special kind of appetition or tendency than as a special kind of perception.  This is because reasoning is not just one perception, but rather a series of perceptions.  Leibniz for instance calls it “a chain of truths” (New Essays, p. 199) and defines it as “the linking together of truths” (Huggard, p. 73).  Thus, reasoning is not the same as perceiving a certain type of object, nor as perceiving an object in a particular fashion.  Rather, it consists mainly in special types of transitions between perceptions and therefore, according to Leibniz’s account of how monads transition from perception to perception, in appetitions for these transitions.  What a mind needs in order to be rational, therefore, are appetitions that one could call the principles of reasoning.  These appetitions or principles allow minds to transition, for instance, from the premises of an argument to its conclusion.  In order to conclude ‘Socrates is mortal’ from ‘All men are mortal’ and ‘Socrates is a man,’ for example, I not only need to perceive the premises distinctly, but I also need an appetition for transitioning from premises of a particular form to conclusions of a particular form.

Leibniz states in several texts that our reasonings are based on two fundamental principles: the Principle of Contradiction and the Principle of Sufficient Reason.  Human beings also have access to several additional innate truths and principles, for instance those of logic, mathematics, ethics, and theology.  In virtue of these principles we have a priori knowledge of necessary connections between things, while animals can only have empirical knowledge of contingent, or merely apparent, connections.  The perceptions of animals, then, are not governed by the principles on which our reasonings are based; the closest an animal can come to reasoning is, as mentioned, engaging in empirical inference or induction, which is based not on principles of reasoning, but merely on the recognition and memory of regularities in previous experience.  This confirms that reasoning is a type of appetition: using, or being able to use, principles of reasoning cannot just be a matter of perceiving the world more distinctly.  In fact, these principles are not something that we acquire or derive from perceptions.  Instead, at least the most basic ones are innate dispositions for making certain kinds of transitions.

In connection with reasoning, it is important to note that even though Leibniz sometimes uses the term ‘thought’ for perceptions generally, he makes it clear in some texts that it strictly speaking belongs exclusively to minds because it is “perception joined with reason” (Strickland p. 66; see also New Essays, p. 210).  This means that the ability to think in this sense, just like reasoning, is also something that is exclusive to minds, that is, something that distinguishes minds from animal souls.  Non-rational souls neither reason nor think, strictly speaking; they do however have perceptions.

The distinctive cognitive and appetitive capacities of the three types of monads are summarized in the following table:

Leibniz-Mind table

2. Freedom

One final capacity that sets human beings apart from non-rational animals is the capacity for acting freely.  This is mainly because Leibniz closely connects free agency with rationality: acting freely requires acting in accordance with one’s rational assessment of which course of action is best.  Hence, acting freely involves rational perceptions as well as rational appetitions.  It requires both knowledge of, or rational judgments about, the good, as well as the tendency to act in accordance with these judgments.  For Leibniz, the capacity for rational judgments is called ‘intellect,’ and the tendency to pursue what the intellect judges to be best is called ‘will.’  Non-human animals, because they do not possess intellects and wills, or the requisite type of perceptions and appetitions, lack freedom.  This also means, however, that most human actions are not free, because we only sometimes reason about the best course of action and act voluntarily, on the basis of our rational judgments.  Leibniz in fact stresses that in three quarters of their actions, human beings act just like animals, that is, without making use of their rationality (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).

In addition to rationality, Leibniz claims, free actions must be self-determined and contingent (see e.g. Theodicy, section 288).  An action is self-determined—or spontaneous, as Leibniz often calls it—when its source is in the agent, rather than in another agent or some other external entity.  While all actions of monads are spontaneous in a general sense since, as we will see in section four, Leibniz denies all interaction among created substances, he may have a more demanding notion of spontaneity in mind when he calls it a requirement for freedom.  After all, when an agent acts on the basis of her rational judgment, she is not even subject to the kind of apparent influence of her body or of other creatures that is present, for instance, when someone pinches her and she feels pain.

In order to be contingent, on the other hand, the action cannot be the result of compulsion or necessitation.  This, again, is generally true for all actions of monads because Leibniz holds that all changes in the states of a creature are contingent.  Yet, there may again be an especially demanding sense in which free actions are contingent for Leibniz.  He often says that when a rational agent does something because she believes it to be best, the goodness she perceives, or her motives for acting, merely incline her towards action without necessitating action (see e.g. Huggard, p. 419; Fifth Letter to Clarke, sections 8-9; Ariew and Garber, p. 195; New Essays, p. 175).  Hence, Leibniz may be attributing a particular kind of contingency to free actions.

Even though Leibniz holds that free actions must be contingent, that is, that they cannot be necessary, he grants that they can be determined.  In fact, Leibniz vehemently rejects the notion that a world with free agents must contain genuine indeterminacy.  Hence, Leibniz is what we today call a compatibilist about freedom and determinism (see Free Will).  He believes that all actions, whether they are free or not, are determined by the nature and the prior states of the agent.  What is special about free actions, then, is not that they are undetermined, but rather that they are determined, among other things, by rational perceptions of the good.  We always do what we are most strongly inclined to do, for Leibniz, and if we are most strongly inclined by our judgment about the best course of action, we pursue that course of action freely.  The ability to act contrary even to one’s best reasons or motives, Leibniz contends, is not required for freedom, nor would it be worth having.   As Leibniz puts it in the New Essays, “the freedom to will contrary to all the impressions which may come from the understanding … would destroy true liberty, and reason with it, and would bring us down below the beasts” (p. 180).  In fact, being determined by our rational understanding of the good, as we are in our free actions, makes us godlike, because according to Leibniz, God is similarly determined by what he judges to be best.  Nothing could be more perfect and more desirable than acting in this way.

3. The Mill Argument

In several of his writings, Leibniz argues that purely material things such as brains or machines cannot possibly think or perceive.  Hence, Leibniz contends that materialists like Thomas Hobbes are wrong to think that they can explain mentality in terms of the brain.  This argument is without question among Leibniz’s most influential contributions to the philosophy of mind.  It is relevant not only to the question whether human minds might be purely material, but also to the question whether artificial intelligence is possible.  Because Leibniz’s argument against perception in material objects often employs a thought experiment involving a mill, interpreters refer to it as ‘the mill argument.’  There is considerable disagreement among recent scholars about the correct interpretation of this argument (see References and Further Reading).  The present section sketches one plausible way of interpreting Leibniz’s mill argument.

The most famous version of Leibniz’s mill argument occurs in section 17 of the Monadology:

Moreover, we must confess that perception, and what depends on it, is inexplicable in terms of mechanical reasons, that is, through shapes and motions.  If we imagine that there is a machine whose structure makes it think, sense, and have perceptions, we could conceive it enlarged, keeping the same proportions, so that we could enter into it, as one enters into a mill.  Assuming that, when inspecting its interior, we will only find parts that push one another, and we will never find anything to explain a perception.  And so, we should seek perception in the simple substance and not in the composite or in the machine.

To understand this argument, it is important to recall that Leibniz, like many of his contemporaries, views all material things as infinitely divisible.  As already seen, he holds that there are no smallest or most fundamental material elements, and every material thing, no matter how small, has parts and is hence complex.  Even if there were physical atoms—against which Leibniz thinks he has conclusive metaphysical arguments—they would still have to be extended, like all matter, and we would hence be able to distinguish between an atom’s left half and its right half.  The only truly simple things that exist are monads, that is, unextended, immaterial, mind-like things.  Based on this understanding of material objects, Leibniz argues in the mill passage that only immaterial entities are capable of perception because it is impossible to explain perception mechanically, or in terms of material parts pushing one another.

Unfortunately Leibniz does not say explicitly why exactly he thinks there cannot be a mechanical explanation of perception.  Yet it becomes clear in other passages that for Leibniz perceiving has to take place in a simple thing.  This assumption, in turn, straightforwardly implies that matter—which as seen is complex—is incapable of perception.  This, most likely, is behind Leibniz’s mill argument.  Why does Leibniz claim that perception can only take place in simple things?  If he did not have good reasons for this claim, after all, it would not constitute a convincing starting point for his mill argument.

Leibniz’s reasoning appears to be the following.  Material things, such as mirrors or paintings, can represent complexity.  When I stand in front of a mirror, for instance, the mirror represents my body.  This is an example of the representation of one complex material thing in another complex material thing.  Yet, Leibniz argues, we do not call such a representation ‘perception’: the mirror does not “perceive” my body.  The reason this representation falls short of perception, Leibniz contends, is that it lacks the unity that is characteristic of perceptions: the top part of the mirror represents the top part of my body, and so on.  The representation of my body in the mirror is merely a collection of smaller representations, without any genuine unity.  When another person perceives my body, on the other hand, her representation of my body is a unified whole.  No physical thing can do better than the mirror in this respect: the only way material things can represent anything is through the arrangement or properties of their parts.  As a result, any such representation will be spread out over multiple parts of the representing material object and hence lack genuine unity.  It is arguably for this reason that Leibniz defines ‘perception’ as “the passing state which involves and represents a multitude in the unity or in the simple substance” (Monadology, section 14).

Leibniz’s mill argument, then, relies on a particular understanding of perception and of material objects.  Because all material objects are complex and because perceptions require unity, material objects cannot possibly perceive.  Any representation a machine, or a material object, could produce would lack the unity required for perception.  The mill example is supposed to illustrate this: even an extremely small machine, if it is purely material, works only in virtue of the arrangement of its parts.  Hence, it is always possible, at least in principle, to enlarge the machine.  When we imagine the machine thus enlarged, that is, when we imagine being able to distinguish the machine’s parts as we can distinguish the parts of a mill, we will realize that the machine cannot possibly have genuine perceptions.

Yet the basic idea behind Leibniz’s mill argument can be appealing even to those of us who do not share Leibniz’s assumptions about perception and material objects.  In fact, it appears to be a more general version of what is today called “the hard problem of consciousness," that is, the problem of explaining how something physical could explain, or give rise to, consciousness.  While Leibniz’s mill argument is about perception generally, rather than conscious perception in particular, the underlying structure of the argument appears to be similar: mental states have characteristics—such as their unity or their phenomenal properties—that, it seems, cannot even in principle be explained physically.  There is an explanatory gap between the physical and the mental.

4. The Relation between Mind and Body

The mind-body problem is a central issue in the philosophy of mind.  It is, roughly, the problem of explaining how mind and body can causally interact.  That they interact seems exceedingly obvious: my mental states, such as for instance my desire for a cold drink, do seem capable of producing changes in my body, such as the bodily motions required for walking to the fridge and retrieving a bottle of water.  Likewise, certain physical states seem capable of producing changes in my mind: when I stub my toe on my way to the fridge, for instance, this event in my body appears to cause me pain, which is a mental state.  For Descartes and his followers, it is notoriously difficult to explain how mind and body causally interact.  After all, Cartesians are substance dualists: they believe that mind and body are substances of a radically different type (see Descartes: Mind-Body Distinction).  How could a mental state such as a desire cause a physical state such as a bodily motion, or vice versa, if mind and body have absolutely nothing in common?  This is the version of the mind-body problem that Cartesians face.

For Leibniz, the mind-body problem does not arise in exactly the way it arises for Descartes and his followers, because Leibniz is not a substance dualist.  We have already seen that, according to Leibniz, an animal or human being has a central monad, which constitutes its soul, as well as subordinate monads that are everywhere in its body.  In fact, Leibniz appears to hold that the body just is the collection of these subordinate monads and their perceptions (see e.g. Principles of Nature and Grace section 3), or that bodies result from monads (Ariew and Garber, p. 179).  After all, as already seen, he holds that purely material, extended things would not only be incapable of perception, but would also not be real because of their infinite divisibility.  The only truly real things, for Leibniz, are monads, that is, immaterial and indivisible substances.  This means that Leibniz, unlike Descartes, does not believe that there are two fundamentally different kinds of substances, namely physical and mental substances.  Instead, for Leibniz, all substances are of the same general type.  As a result, the mind-body problem may seem more tractable for Leibniz: if bodies have a semi-mental nature, there are fewer obvious obstacles to claiming that bodies and minds can interact with one another.

Yet, for complicated reasons that are beyond the scope of this article (but see Leibniz: Causation), Leibniz held that human minds and their bodies—as well as any created substances, in fact—cannot causally interact.  In this, he agrees with occasionalists such as Nicolas Malebranche.  Leibniz departs from occasionalists, however, in his positive account of the relation between mental and corresponding bodily events.  Occasionalists hold that God needs to intervene in nature constantly to establish this correspondence.  When I decide to move my foot, for instance, God intervenes and moves my foot accordingly, occasioned by my decision.  Leibniz, however, thinks that such interventions would constitute perpetual miracles and be unworthy of a God who always acts in the most perfect manner.  God arranged things so perfectly, Leibniz contends, that there is no need for these divine interventions.  Even though he endorses the traditional theological doctrine that God continually conserves all creatures in existence and concurs with their actions (see Leibniz: Causation), Leibniz stresses that all natural events in the created world are caused and made intelligible by the natures of created things.  In other words, Leibniz rejects the occasionalist doctrine that God is the only active, efficient cause, and that the laws of nature that govern natural events are merely God’s intentions to move his creatures around in a particular way.  Instead for Leibniz these laws, or God’s decrees about the ways in which created things should behave, are written into the natures of these creatures.  God not only decided how creatures should act, but also gave them natures and natural powers from which these actions follow.  To understand the regularities and events in nature, we do not need to look beyond the natures of creatures.  This, Leibniz claims, is much more worthy of a perfect God than the occasionalist world, in which natural events are not internally intelligible.

How, then, does Leibniz explain the correspondence between mental and bodily states if he denies that there is genuine causal interaction among finite things and also denies that God brings about the correspondence by constantly intervening?  Consider again the example in which I decide to get a drink from the fridge and my body executes that decision.  It may seem that unless there is a fairly direct link between my decision and the action—either a link supplied by God’s intervention, or by the power of my mind to cause bodily motion—it would be an enormous coincidence that my body carries out my decision.  Yet, Leibniz thinks there is a third option, which he calls ‘pre-established harmony.’  On this view, God created my body and my mind in such a way that they naturally, but without any direct causal links, correspond to one another.  God knew, before he created my body, that I would decide to get a cold drink, and hence made my body in such a way that it will, in virtue of its own nature, walk to the fridge and get a bottle of water right after my mind makes that decision.

In one text, Leibniz provides a helpful analogy for his doctrine of pre-established harmony.  Imagine two pendulum clocks that are in perfect agreement for a long period of time.  There are three ways to ensure this kind of correspondence between them: (a) establishing a causal link, such as a connection between the pendulums of these clocks, (b) asking a person constantly to synchronize the two clocks, and (c) designing and constructing these clocks so perfectly that they will remain perfectly synchronized without any causal links or adjustments (see Ariew and Garber, pp. 147-148).  Option (c), Leibniz contends, is superior to the other two options, and it is in this way that God ensures that the states of my mind correspond to the states of my body, or in fact, that the perceptions of any created substance harmonize with the perceptions of any other.  The world is arranged and designed so perfectly that events in one substance correspond to events in another substance even though they do not causally interact, and even though God does not intervene to adjust one to the other.  Because of his infinite wisdom and foreknowledge, God was able to pre-establish this mutual correspondence or harmony when he created the world, analogously to the way a skilled clockmaker can construct two clocks that perfectly correspond to one another for a period of time.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources in English Translation

  • Ariew, Roger and Daniel Garber, eds. Philosophical Essays. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
    • Contains translations of many of Leibniz’s most important shorter writings such as the Monadology, the Principles of Nature and Grace, the Discourse on Metaphysics, and excerpts from Leibniz’s correspondence, to name just a few.
  • Ariew, Roger, ed.  Correspondence [between Leibniz and Clarke]. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2000.
    • A translation of Leibniz’s correspondence with Samuel Clarke, which touches on many important topics in metaphysics and philosophy of mind.
  • Francks, Richard and Roger S. Woolhouse, eds. Leibniz's 'New System' and Associated Contemporary Texts. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Francks, Richard and Roger S. Woolhouse, eds. Philosophical Texts. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Huggard, E. M., ed. Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man and the Origin of Evil. La Salle: Open Court, 1985.
    • Translation of the only philosophical monograph Leibniz published in his lifetime, which contains many important discussions of free will.
  • Lodge, Paul, ed. The Leibniz–De Volder Correspondence: With Selections from the Correspondence between Leibniz and Johann Bernoulli. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2013.
    • An edition, with English translations, of Leibniz’s correspondence with De Volder, which is a very important source of information about Leibniz’s mature metaphysics.
  • Loemker, Leroy E., ed. Philosophical Papers and Letters. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1970.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Look, Brandon and Donald Rutherford, eds. The Leibniz–Des Bosses Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2007.
    • An edition, with English translations, of Leibniz’s correspondence with Des Bosses, which is another important source of information about Leibniz’s mature metaphysics.
  • Parkinson, George Henry Radcliffe and Mary Morris, eds. Philosophical Writings. London: Everyman, 1973.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Remnant, Peter and Jonathan Francis Bennett, eds. New Essays on Human Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • Translation of Leibniz’s section-by-section response to Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding, written in the form of a dialogue between the two fictional characters Philalethes and Theophilus, who represent Locke’s and Leibniz’s views, respectively.
  • Rescher, Nicholas, ed. G.W. Leibniz's Monadology: An Edition for Students. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1991.
    • An edition, with English translation, of the Monadology, with commentary and a useful collection of parallel passages from other Leibniz texts.
  • Strickland, Lloyd H., ed. The Shorter Leibniz Texts: A Collection of New Translations. London: Continuum, 2006.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
    • One of the most influential and rigorous works on Leibniz’s metaphysics.
  • Borst, Clive. "Leibniz and the Compatibilist Account of Free Will." Studia Leibnitiana 24.1 (1992): 49-58.
    • About Leibniz’s views on free will.
  • Brandom, Robert. "Leibniz and Degrees of Perception." Journal of the History of Philosophy 19 (1981): 447-79.
    • About Leibniz’s views on perception and perceptual distinctness.
  • Davidson, Jack. "Imitators of God: Leibniz on Human Freedom." Journal of the History of Philosophy 36.3 (1998): 387-412.
    • Another helpful article about Leibniz’s views on free will and on the ways in which human freedom resembles divine freedom.
  • Davidson, Jack. "Leibniz on Free Will." The Continuum Companion to Leibniz. Ed. Brandon Look. London: Continuum, 2011. 208-222.
    • Accessible general introduction to Leibniz’s views on freedom of the will.
  • Duncan, Stewart. "Leibniz's Mill Argument Against Materialism." Philosophical Quarterly 62.247 (2011): 250-72.
    • Helpful discussion of Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • Garber, Daniel. Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • A thorough study of the development of Leibniz’s metaphysical views.
  • Gennaro, Rocco J. "Leibniz on Consciousness and Self-Consciousness." New Essays on the Rationalists. Eds. Rocco J. Gennaro and C. Huenemann. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. 353-371.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s views on consciousness and highlights the advantages of reading Leibniz as endorsing a higher-order thought theory of consciousness.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. Leibniz. London; New York: Routledge, 2005.
    • Good general introduction to Leibniz’s philosophy; includes chapters on the mind and freedom.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "Leibniz on Memory and Consciousness." British Journal for the History of Philosophy 19.5 (2011a): 887-916.
    • Elaborates on Jorgensen (2009) and discusses the role of memory in Leibniz’s theory of consciousness.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "Mind the Gap: Reflection and Consciousness in Leibniz." Studia Leibnitiana 43.2 (2011b): 179-95.
    • About Leibniz’s account of reflection and reasoning.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "The Principle of Continuity and Leibniz's Theory of Consciousness." Journal of the History of Philosophy 47.2 (2009): 223-48.
    • Argues against ascribing a higher-order theory of consciousness to Leibniz.
  • Kulstad, Mark. Leibniz on Apperception, Consciousness, and Reflection. Munich: Philosophia, 1991.
    • Influential, meticulous study of Leibniz’s views on consciousness.
  • Kulstad, Mark. "Leibniz, Animals, and Apperception." Studia Leibnitiana 13 (1981): 25-60.
    • A shorter discussion of some of the issues in Kulstad (1991).
  • Lodge, Paul, and Marc E. Bobro. "Stepping Back Inside Leibniz's Mill." The Monist 81.4 (1998): 553-72.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • Lodge, Paul. "Leibniz's Mill Argument Against Mechanical Materialism Revisited." Ergo (2014).
    • Further discussion of Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • McRae, Robert. Leibniz: Perception, Apperception, and Thought. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1976.
    • An important and still helpful, even if somewhat dated, study of Leibniz’s philosophy of mind.
  • Murray, Michael J. "Spontaneity and Freedom in Leibniz." Leibniz: Nature and Freedom. Eds. Donald Rutherford and Jan A. Cover. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005. 194-216.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s views on free will and self-determination, or spontaneity.
  • Phemister, Pauline. "Leibniz, Freedom of Will and Rationality." Studia Leibnitiana 26.1 (1991): 25-39.
    • Explores the connections between rationality and freedom in Leibniz.
  • Rozemond, Marleen. "Leibniz on the Union of Body and Soul." Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 79.2 (1997): 150-78.
    • About the mind-body problem and pre-established harmony in Leibniz.
  • Rozemond, Marleen. "Mills Can't Think: Leibniz's Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Res Philosophica 91.1 (2014): 1-28.
    • Another helpful discussion of the mill argument.
  • Savile, Anthony. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Leibniz and the Monadology. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Very accessible introduction to Leibniz’s Monadology.
  • Simmons, Alison. "Changing the Cartesian Mind: Leibniz on Sensation, Representation and Consciousness." The Philosophical Review 110.1 (2001): 31-75.
    • Insightful discussion of the ways in which Leibniz’s philosophy of mind differs from the Cartesian view; also argues that Leibnizian consciousness consists in higher-order perceptions.
  • Sotnak, Eric. "The Range of Leibnizian Compatibilism." New Essays on the Rationalists. Eds. Rocco J. Gennaro and C. Huenemann. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. 200-223.
    • About Leibniz’s theory of freedom.
  • Swoyer, Chris. "Leibnizian Expression." Journal of the History of Philosophy 33 (1995): 65-99.
    • About Leibnizian perception.
  • Wilson, Margaret Dauler. "Confused Vs. Distinct Perception in Leibniz: Consciousness, Representation, and God's Mind." Ideas and Mechanism: Essays on Early Modern Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1999. 336-352.
    • About Leibnizian perception as well as perceptual distinctness.


Author Information

Julia Jorati
The Ohio State University
U. S. A.

Kwasi Wiredu (1931— )

Kwasi Wiredu is a philosopher from Ghana, who has for decades been involved with a project he terms “conceptual decolonization” in contemporary African systems of thought.  By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two aims.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavory aspects of tribal culture embedded in modern African thought so as to make that thought more viable.  Second, he intends to dislodge unnecessary Western epistemologies that are to be found in African philosophical practices.

In previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topical issue both at the highest theoretical levels and also at the basic level of everyday existence. After African countries attained political liberation, decolonization became an immediate and overwhelming preoccupation.  A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways.  The disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature, and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic conundrums of decolonization.

A central purpose in this article is to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophy in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In this light, it sometimes appears that African philosophy has been quite limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization has been rightly conceived as a vast, global, and trans-disciplinary enterprise.

This analysis involves an examination of both the limitations and immense possibilities of Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization.  First, the article offers a close reading of the theory itself and then locates it within the broader movement of modern African thought.  In several instances, Wiredu’s theory has proved seminal to the advancement of contemporary African philosophical practices.  It is also necessary to be aware of current imperatives of globalization, nationality, and territoriality and how they affect the agency of a theory such as ideological/conceptual decolonization.  Indeed, the notion of decolonization is far more complex than is often assumed.  Consequently, the epistemological resources by which it can be apprehended as a concept, ideology, or process are multiple and diverse.  Lastly, this article, as a whole, represents a reflection on the diversity of the dimensions of decolonization.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Early Beginnings
  3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice
  4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development
  5. An African Reading of Karl Marx
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Kwasi Wiredu is one of Africa’s foremost philosophers, and he has done a great deal to establish the discipline of philosophy, in its contemporary shape, as a credible area of intellection in most parts of the African continent and beyond.  In order to appreciate the conceptual and historical contexts of his work, it is necessary to possess some familiarity with relevant discourses in African studies and history, anthropology, literature and postcolonial theory, particularly those advanced by Edward W. Said, Gayatri Spivak, Homi Bhabha, Abiola Irele and Biodun Jeyifo.  Wiredu’s contribution to the making of modern African thought provides an interesting insight into the processes involved in the formation of postcolonial disciplines and discourses, and it can also be conceived as a counter-articulation to the hegemonic discourses of imperial domination.

 Wiredu, for many decades, was involved with a project he termed conceptual decolonization in contemporary African systems of thought. This term entailed, for Wiredu, a re-examination of current African epistemic foundations in order to accomplish two main objectives.  First, he intended to undermine counter-productive facets of tribal cultures embedded in modern African, thought so as to make this body of thought both more sustainable and more rational.  Second, he intended to deconstruct the unnecessary Western epistemologies which may be found in African philosophical practices.

A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways. In particular, the disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic challenges inherent to decolonization.

It is usually profitable to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophers comparatively (along with other African thinkers who are not professional philosophers) in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In addition to the scholars noted above, the discourse of decolonialization has benefitted from many valuable contributions made by intellectuals such as Frantz Fanon, Leopold Sedar Senghor, Cheikh Anta Diop, and Ngugi wa Thiongo.  In this light, it would appear that African philosophy has been, at certain moments, limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature, postcolonial theory and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization, as Ngugi wa Thiongo, the Kenyan cultural theorist and novelist, notes, must be conceived as a broad, transcontinental, and multidisciplinary venture.

Within the Anglophone contingent of African philosophy, the analytic tradition of British philosophy continues to be dominant.  This discursive hegemony had led an evident degree of parochialism.  This in turn has led to the neglect of many other important intellectual traditions.  For instance, within this Anglophonic sphere, there is not always a systematic interrogation of the limits, excesses and uses of colonialist anthropology in formulating the problematic of identity.  In this regard, the problematic of identity does not only refer to the question of personal agency but more broadly, the challenges of discursive identity.  This shortcoming is not as evident in Francophone traditions of African philosophy, which usually highlight the foundational discursive interactions between anthropology and modern African thought.  Thus, in this instance, there is an opening to other discursive formations necessary for the nurturing a vibrant philosophical practice.  Also, within Anglophone African philosophy, a stringent critique of imperialism and contemporary globalization does not always figure is not always significantly in the substance of the discourse, thereby further underlining the drawbacks of parochialism.  As such, it is necessary for critiques of Wiredu’s corpus to move beyond its ostensible frame to include critiques and discussions of traditions of philosophical practice outside the Anglophone divide of modern African thought (Osha, 2005).  Accordingly, such critiques ought not merely be a celebration of post-structuralist discourses to the detriment of African intellectual traditions.  Instead, they should be, among other things, an exploration of the discursive intimacies between the Anglophone and Francophone traditions of African philosophy.  In addition, an interrogation of other borders of philosophy is required to observe the gains that might accrue to the Anglophone movement of contemporary African philosophy, which, in many ways, has reached a discursive dead-end due to its inability to surmount the intractable problematic of identity, and its endless preoccupation with the question of its origins. These are the sort of interrogations that readings of Wiredu’s work necessitate. Furthermore, a study of Wiredu’s corpus (Osha, 2005) identifies—if only obliquely—the necessity to re-assess the importance of other discourses such as colonialist anthropology and various philosophies of black subjectivity in the formation of the modern African subject.  These are some of the central concerns which appear in Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa (2005).

2. Early Beginnings

Kwasi Wiredu was born in 1931 in Ghana and had his first exposure to philosophy quite early in life.  He read his first couple of books of philosophy in school around 1947 in Kumasi, the capital of Ashanti.  These books were Bernard Bosanquet’s The Essentials of Logic and C.E.M. Joad’s Teach Yourself Philosophy.  Logic, as a branch of philosophy attracted Wiredu because of its affinities to grammar, which he enjoyed.  He was also fond of practical psychology during the formative years of his life.  In 1950, whilst vacationing with his aunt in Accra, the capital of Ghana, he came across another philosophical text which influenced him tremendously.  The text was The Last Days of Socrates which had the following four dialogues by Plato: The Apology, Euthyphro, Meno and Crito. These dialogues were to influence, in a significant way, the final chapter of his first groundbreaking philosophical text, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) which is also dialogic in structure.

He was admitted into the University of Ghana, Legon in 1952, to read philosophy, but before attending he started to study the thought of John Dewey on his own. However, mention must be made of the fact that C. E. M. Joad’s philosophy had a particularly powerful effect on him. Indeed, he employed the name J. E. Joad as his pen-name for a series of political articles he wrote for a national newspaper, The Ashanti Sentinel between 1950 and1951.  At the University of Ghana, he was instructed mainly in Western philosophy and he came to find out about African traditions of thought more or less through his own individual efforts.  He was later to admit that the character of his undergraduate education was to leave his mind a virtual tabula rasa, as far as African philosophy was concerned.  In other words, he had to develop and maintain his interests in African philosophy on his own. One of the first texts of African philosophy that he read was J. B. Danquah’s Akan Doctrine of God: A Fragment of Gold Coast Ethics and Religion.  Undoubtedly, his best friend William Abraham, who went a year before him to Oxford University, must have also influenced the direction of his philosophical research towards African thought.  A passage from an interview explains the issue of his institutional relation to African philosophy:

Prior to 1985, when I was in Africa, I devoted most of my time in almost equal proportions to research in African philosophy and in other areas of philosophy, such as the philosophy of logic, in which not much has, or is generally known to have, been done in African philosophy.  I did not have always to be teaching African philosophy or giving public lectures in African philosophy. There were others who were also competent to teach the subject and give talks in our Department of Philosophy.  But since I came to the United States, I have often been called upon to teach or talk about African philosophy.  I have therefore spent much more time than before researching in that area. This does not mean that I have altogether ignored my earlier interests, for indeed, I continue to teach subjects like (Western) logic and epistemology (Wiredu in Oladiop 2002: 332).

Wiredu began publishing relatively late, but has been exceedingly prolific ever since he started. During the early to mid 1970s, he often published as many as six major papers per year on topics ranging from logic, to epistemology, to African systems of thought, in reputable international journals.  His first major book, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) is truly remarkable for its eclectic range of interests.  Paulin Hountondji, Wiredu’s great contemporary from the Republic of Benin, for many years had to deal with charges that his philosophically impressive corpus lacked ideological content and therefore merit from critics such as Olabiyi Yai (1977).  Hountondji (1983; 2002) in those times of extreme ideologizing, never avoided the required measure of socialist posturing.  Wiredu, on the other hand, not only avoided the lure of socialism but went on to denounce it as an unfit ideology.  Within the context of the socio-political moment of that era, it seemed a reactionary—even injurious—posture to adopt.  Nonetheless, he had not only laid the foundations of his project of conceptual decolonization at the theoretical level but had also begun to explore its various practical implications by his analyses of concepts such as “truth,” and also by his focused critique of some of the more counter-productive impacts of both colonialism and traditional culture.

By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two objectives.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavoury aspects of indigenous traditions embedded in modern African thought so as to make it more viable.  Second, he intends to undermine the unhelpful Western epistemologies to be found in African philosophical traditions. On this important formulation of his he states:

By this I mean the purging of African philosophical thinking of all uncritical assimilation of Western ways of thinking. That, of course, would be only part of the battle won. The other desiderata are the careful study of our own traditional philosophies and the synthesising of any insights obtained from that source with any other insights that might be gained from the intellectual resources of the modern world.  In my opinion, it is only by such a reflective integration of the traditional and the modern that contemporary African philosophers can contribute to the flourishing of our peoples and, ultimately, all other peoples. (Oladipo, 2002: 328)

In spite of his invaluable contributions to modern African thought, it can be argued that Wiredu’s schema falls short as a feasible long term epistemic project.  Due to the hybridity of the postcolonial condition, projects seeking to retrieve the precolonial heritage are bound to be marred at several levels.  It would be an error for Wiredu or advocates of his project of conceptual decolonization to attempt to universalize his theory since, as Ngugi wa Thiongo argues, decolonization is a vast, global enterprise.  Rather, it is safer to read Wiredu’s project as a way of articulating theoretical presence for the de-agentialized and deterritorialized contemporary African subject.  In many ways, his project resembles those of Ngugi wa Thiongo and Cheikh Anta Diop.  Ngugi wa Thiongo advocates cultural and linguistic decolonization on a global scale and his theory has undergone very little transformation since its formulation in the 1960s.  Diop advances a similar set of ideas to Wiredu on the subject of vibrant modern African identities. Wiredu’s project is linked in conceptual terms to the broader project of political decolonization as advanced by liberationist African leaders such as Julius Nyerere, Jomo Kenyatta, Kwame Nkrumah, and Nnamdi Azikiwe.  But what distinguishes the particular complexion of his theory is its links with the Anglo-Saxon analytic tradition. This dimension is important in differentiating his project from those of his equally illustrious contemporaries such as V. Y. Mudimbe and Paulin Hountondji.  In fact, it can be argued that Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization has more similarities with Ngugi wa Thiongo’s ideas regarding African cultural and linguistic agency than Mudimbe’s archeological excavations of African traces in Western historical and anthropological texts.

3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice

In all previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topic of considerable academic interest.  Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization is essentially what defines his attitudes and gestures towards the content of contemporary African thought.  Also it is an insight that is inflected by years of immersion into British analytic philosophy.  Wiredu began his reflections of the nature, legitimate aims, and possible orientations in contemporary African thought not as a result of any particular awareness of the trauma or violence of colonialism or imperialism but by a confrontation with the dilemma of modernity by the reflective (post)colonial African consciousness.  This dialectic origin can be contrasted with those of his contemporaries such as Paulin Hountondji and V. Y. Mudimbe.

Despite criticisms regarding some aspects of his work, in terms of founding a tradition for the practice of modern African philosophy, Wiredu’s contributions have been pivotal. He has also been very consistent in his output and the quality of his reflections regardless of some of their more obvious limitations.

As noted earlier, Wiredu was trained in a particular tradition of Western philosophy: the analytic tradition.  This fact is reflected in his corpus.  A major charge held against him is that his contributions could be made even richer if he had grappled with other relevant discourses: postcolonial theory, African feminisms, contemporary Afrocentric discourses and the global dimensions of projects and discourses of decolonization.

Kwasi Wiredu’s interests and philosophical importance are certainly not limited to conceptual decolonization alone.  He has offered some useful insights on Marxism, mysticism, metaphysics, and the general nature of the philosophical enterprise itself. Although his latter text, Cultural Universals and Particulars has a more Africa-centred orientation, his first book, Philosophy and an African Culture presents a wider range of discursive interests: a vigorous critique of Marxism, reflections on the phenomenon of ideology, analyses of truth and the philosophy of language, among other preoccupations. It is interesting to see how Wiredu weaves together these different preoccupations and also to observe how some of them have endured while others have not.

The volume Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy is an apt summation of Wiredu’s philosophical interests with a decidedly African problematic while his landmark philosophical work, Philosophy and an African Culture, published first in 1980, should serve as a fertile source for more detailed elucidation.

In the second essay of Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy entitled “The Need for Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy”, Wiredu writes that “with an even greater sense of urgency the intervening decade does not seem to have brought any indications of a widespread realization of the need for conceptual decolonisation in African philosophy” (Wiredu, 1995: 23).  The intention at this juncture is to examine some of the ways in which Wiredu has been involved in the daunting task of conceptual decolonization.  Decolonization itself is a problematic exercise because it necessitates the jettisoning of certain conceptual attitudes that inform one’s worldviews.  Secondly, it usually entails an attempt at the retrieval of a more or less fragmented historical heritage.  Decolonization in Fanon’s conception entails this necessity for all colonized peoples and, in addition, it is “a programme of complete disorder” (Fanon, 1963:20).  This understanding is purely political and has therefore, a practical import.  This is not to say that Fanon had no plan for the project of decolonization in the intellectual sphere.  Also associated with this project as it was then conceived was a struggle for the mental liberation of the colonized African peoples.  It was indeed a program of violence in more senses than one.

However, with Wiredu, there isn’t an outright endorsement of violence, as decolonization in this instance amounts to conceptual subversion.  As a logical consequence, it is necessary to stress the difference between Fanon’s conception of decolonization and Wiredu’s.  Fanon is sometimes regarded as belonging to the same philosophical persuasion that harbours figures like Nkrumah, Senghor, Nyerere and Sekou Toure, “the philosopher-kings of early post-independence Africa” (Wiredu,1995:14), as Wiredu calls them.  This is so because they had to live out the various dramas of existence and the struggles for self and collective identity at more or less the same colonial/postcolonial moment.  Those “spiritual uncles” of professional African philosophers were engaged, as Wiredu states, in a strictly political struggle, and whatever philosophical insight they possessed was put at the disposal of this struggle, instead of a merely theoretical endeavour.  Obviously, Fanon was the most astute theoretician of decolonization of the lot.  In addition, for Fanon and the so-called philosopher-kings, decolonization was invested with a pan-African mandate and political appeal.  This crucial difference should be noted alongside what shall soon be demonstrated to be the Wiredu conception of decolonization.  Africans, generally, will have to continue to ponder the entire issue of decolonization as long as unsolved questions of identity remain and the challenges of collective development linger.  This type of challenge was foreseen by Fanon.

The end of colonialism in Africa and other Third World countries did not entail the end of imperialism and the dominance of the metropolitan countries.  Instead, the dynamics of dominance assumed a more complex, if subtle, form.  African economic systems floundered alongside African political institutions, and, as a result, various crises have compounded the seemingly perennial issue of underdevelopment.

A significant portion of post-colonial theory involves the entry of Third World scholars into the Western archive, as it were, with the intention of dislodging the erroneous epistemological assumptions and structures regarding their peoples.  This, arguably, is another variant of decolonization.  Wiredu partakes of this type of activity, but sometimes he carries the program even further.  Accordingly, he affirms:

Until Africa can have a lingua franca, we will have to communicate suitable parts of our work in our multifarious vernaculars, and in other forms of popular discourse, while using the metropolitan languages for international communication. (Wiredu, 1995:20)

This conviction has been a guiding principle with Wiredu for several years.  In fact, it is not merely a conviction; there are several instances within the broad spectrum of his philosophical corpus where he tries to put it into practice.  Two of such attempts are his essays “The Concept of Truth in the Akan Language” and “The Akan Concept of Mind.”  In the first of these articles, Wiredu states “there is no one word in Akan for truth” (Wiredu, 1985:46).  Similarly, he writes, “another linguistic contrast between Akan and English is that there is no word “fact” (Ibid.).  It is necessary to cite the central thesis of the essay; Wiredu writes that he wants “to make a metadoctrinal point which reflection on the African language enables us to see, which is that a theory of truth is not of any real universal significance unless it offers some account of the notion of being so” (Ibid.).

Wiredu’s argument here, needs to be firmer.  In many respects, he is only comparing component parts of the English language with the Akan language and not always with a view to drawing out “any real universal significance” as he says.  The entire approach seems to be irrevocably restrictive.  This is the distinction that lies between an oral culture and a textual one.  Most African intellectuals usually gloss over this difference, even though they may acknowledge it.  The difference is indeed very significant, because of the numerous imponderables that come into play.  Abiola Irele has been able to demonstrate the tremendous significance of orality in the constitution of modern African forms of literary expression.

However, Wiredu is more convincing in his essay “Democracy and Consensus in African Traditional Politics: A Plea for a Non-Party Polity”.  In this essay, Wiredu argues that the:

Ashanti system was a consensual democracy. It was a democracy because government was by the consent, and subject to the control, of the people as expressed through the representatives. It was consensual because, at least, as a rule, that consent was negotiated on the principle of consensus. (By contrast, the majoritarian system might be said to be, in principle, based on consent without consensus.) (Ibid. pp58-59)

When Wiredu broaches the issue of politics and its present and future contexts in postcolonial Africa, then we are compelled to visit a whole range of debates and discourses especially in the social sciences in Africa.  These arearguably more directly concerned with questions pertaining to governance, democracy, and the challenges of contemporary globalization.

Another essay by Wiredu, entitled “The Akan Concept of Mind” is also an attempt of conceptual recontextualization.  Wiredu begins by stating that he is restricting himself to a study of the Akans of Ghana in order “to keep the discussion within reasonable anthropological bounds” (Wiredu, 1983:113).  His objective is a modest but nevertheless important one, since it fits quite well with his entire philosophical project which, as noted, is concerned with ironing out philosophical issues “on independent grounds” and possibly in one’s own language and the metropolitan language bequeathed by the colonial heritage.

It is therefore appropriate to proceed gradually, traversing the problematic interfaces between various languages in search of satisfactory structures of meaning.  The immediate effect is a radical diminishing of the entire concept of African philosophy, a term which under these circumstances would become even more problematic.  The consequence of Wiredu’s position is that to arrive at the essence of African philosophy, it would be necessary to dismantle its monolithic structure to make it more context-bound.  First, Africa as a spatial entity would require further re-drawing of its often problematic geography.  Second, a new thematics to mediate between the general and the particular would have to be found.  Third, the critique of unanimism and ethnophilosophy would be driven into more contested terrains.  These are some of the likely challenges posed by Wiredu’s approach.

Furthermore, in dealing with the traditional Akan conceptual system, or any other, for that matter, it should be borne in mind that what is in contention is “a folk philosophy, a body of originally unwritten ideas preserved in the oral traditions, customs and usages of a people” (Ibid.).

It would be appropriate to examine more closely his article “The Akan Concept of Mind”.  Here, Wiredu enumerates the ways in which the English conception of mind differs markedly from that of the Akan, due in a large part to certain fundamental linguistic dissimilarities.  He also makes the point that “the Akans most certainly do not regard mind as one of the entities that go to constitute a person” (Ibid. 121).  It is significant to note this, but at the same time, it is difficult to imagine the ultimate viability of this approach.  Indeed after reformulating traditional Western philosophical problems to suit African conditions, it remains to be seen how African epistemological claims can be substantiated using the natural and logical procedures available to African systems of thought.  As such, it is possible to argue that this conceptual manoeuvre would eventually degenerate into a dead-end of epistemic nativism.  These are the kinds of issues raised by Wiredu’s project.

As such, inherent in the thrust for complete decolonization is the presence of colonial violence itself.  In addition, there is essentially a latent desire for epistemic violence, as well as difficulties concerning the negotiation of linguistic divides. In the following quotation, for example, Wiredu attempts to demonstrate the significance of some of those differences:

By comparison with the conflation of concepts of mind and soul prevalent in Western philosophy, the Akan separation of the “Okra” from “adwene” suggests a more analytical awareness of the sanctification of human personality. (Ibid.128)

It is necessary to substantiate more rigorously claims such as this because we may also be committing an error in establishing certain troublesome linguistic or philosophical correspondences between two disparate cultures and traditions.

Another crucial, if distressing, feature of decolonization as advanced by Wiredu is that it always has to measure itself up with the colonizing Other, that is, it finds it almost impossible to create its own image so to speak by the employment of autochthonous strategies.  This is not to assert that decolonization always has to avail itself of indigenous procedures, but the very concept of decolonization is in fact concerned with breaking away from imperial structures of dominance in order to express a will to self-identity or presence.  To be sure, the Other is always present, defacing all claims to full presence of the decolonizing subject.  This is a contradictory but inevitable trope within the postcolonial condition.  The Other is always there to present the criteria by which self-identity is adjudged either favourably or unfavourably. There is no getting around the Other as it is introduced in its own latent and covert violence, in the hesitant counter-violence of the decolonizing subject and invariably in the counter-articulations of all projects of decolonization.

4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development

Wiredu’s later attempts at conceptual decolonization have been quite interesting.  An example of such an attempt is the essay “Custom and Morality: A Comparative Analysis of some African and Western Conceptions of Morals.”  He is able to explore at greater length some of the conceptual confusions that arise as a result of the transplantation of Western ideas within an African frame of reference.  This wholesale transference of foreign ideas and conceptual models has caused the occurrence of severe cases of identity crises and, to borrow a more apposite term, colonial mentality.  Indeed, one of the aims of Wiredu’s efforts at conceptual decolonization is to indicate instances of colonial mentality and determine strategies by which they can be minimized.  Accordingly he is quite convincing when he argues that polygamy in a traditional setting amounts to efficient social thinking but is most inappropriate within a modern framework.  In this way, Wiredu is offering a critique of a certain traditional practice that ought to be discarded on account of the demands and realities of a modern economy.

On another level, it appears that Wiredu has not sufficiently interrogated the distance between orality and textuality.  If indeed he has done so, he would be rather more skeptical about the manner in which he thinks he can dislodge certain Western philosophical structures embedded in the African consciousness.

Wiredu has always believed that traditional modes of thought and folk philosophies should be interpreted, clarified, analyzed and subjected to critical evaluation and assimilation (Wiredu, 1980: x).  Also, at the beginning of his philosophical reflections, he puts forth the crucial formulation that there is no reason why the African philosopher “in his philosophical meditations […] should not test formulations in those against intuitions in his own language” (Wiredu, 1980: xi).  And, rather than merely discussing the possibilities for evolving modern traditions in African philosophy, African philosophers should actually begin to do so (Hountondji, 1983).  In carrying out this task, the African philosopher has a few available methodological approaches.  First, he is urged to “acquaint himself with the different philosophies of the different cultures of the world, not to be encylopaedic or eclectic, but with the aim of trying to see how far issues and concepts of universal relevance can be disentangled from the contingencies of culture” (Wiredu, 1980: 31).  He also adds that “the African philosopher has no choice but to conduct his philosophical inquiries in relation to the philosophical writings of other peoples, for his ancestors left him no heritage of philosophical writings” (Wiredu, 1980: 48).  For Wiredu, the use of translations is a fundamental aspect of contemporary African philosophical practices.  However, on the dilemmas of translation in the current age of neoliberalism, it has been noted: “translations are [..] put ‘out of joint.’  However correct or legitimate they may be, and whatever right one may acknowledge them to have, they are all disadjusted, as it were unjust in the gap that affects them.  This gap is within them, to be sure, because their meanings remain necessarily equivocal; next it is in the relation among them and thus their multiplicity, and finally or first of all in the irreducible inadequation to the other language and to the stroke of genius of the event that makes the law, to all the virtualities of the original” (Derrida, 1994:19).  Wiredu does not contemplate the implications of this kind of indictment in his formulations of an approach to African philosophy.  Perhaps the task at hand is simply too important and demanding to cater to such philosophical niceties.  In relation to the kind of philosophical heritage at the disposal of the African philosopher, Wiredu identifies three main strands; “a folk philosophy, a written traditional philosophy and a modern philosophy” (Wiredu, 1980:46).  Wiredu’s approach to questions of this sort is embedded in his general theoretical stance: “It is a function, indeed a duty, of philosophy in any society to examine the intellectual foundations of its culture.  For any such examination to be of any real use, it should take the form of reasoned criticism and, where possible, reconstruction. No other way to philosophical progress is known than through criticism and adaptation” (Wiredu, 1980: 20).

The drive to attain progress is not limited to philosophical discourse alone.  Entire communities and cultures usually aim to improve upon their institutions and practices in order to remain relevant.  Societies can lose the momentum of growth and “various habits of thought and practice can become anachronistic within the context of the development of a given society; but an entire society too can become anachronistic within the context of the whole world if the ways of life within it are predominantly anachronistic.  In the latter case, of course, there is no discarding society; what you do is to modernize it” (Wiredu, 1980:1).  The theme of modernization occurs frequently in Wiredu’s corpus.  He does not fully conceptualize it nor relate it to the various ideological histories it has encountered in the domains of social science, where it became a fully fledged discipline. Modernization, for him, is based on an uncomplicated pragmatism that owes much to Deweyan thought.

This kind of posture, that is, the consistent critique of the retrogression inherent in tradition and its proclivity for the fossilization of culture, is directed at Leopold Sedar Senghor.  On Senghor, he writes, “it is almost as if he has been trying to exemplify in his own thought and discourse the lack of the analytical habit which he has attributed to the biology of the African.  Most seriously of all, Senghor has celebrated the fact our (traditional) mind is of a non-analytical bent; which is very unfortunate, seeing that this mental attribute is more of a limitation than anything else” (Wiredu, 1980:12).  Wiredu’s main criticism of Senghor is one that is always leveled against the latter.  Apart from that charge that Senghor essentializes the concept and ideologies of blackness, he is also charged with defeatism that undermines struggles for liberation and decolonization.  However, Paul Gilroy has unearthed a more sympathetic context in which to read and situate Senghorian thought.  In Gilroy’s reading, an acceptable ideology of blackness emerges from Senghor’s work. And in this way, Wiredu’s critique loses some of its originality.

Senghor is cast as a traditionalist and tradition itself is the subject of a much broader critique.  On some of the drawbacks of tradition Wiredu writes,

it is as true in Africa as anywhere else that logical, mathematical, analytical, experimental procedures are essential in the quest for the knowledge of, and control over, nature and therefore, in any endeavour to improve the condition of man. Our traditional culture was somewhat wanting in this respect and this is largely responsible for the weaknesses of traditional technology, warfare, architecture, medicine….” (Wiredu, 1980: 12) (italics mine)

Sometimes, Wiredu carries his critique of tradition too far as when he advances the view that “traditional medicine is terribly weak in diagnosis and weaker still in pharmacology” (Wiredu, 1980: 12).  In recent times, a major part of Hountondji’s project is to demonstrate that traditional knowledges are not only useful and viable but also the necessity to situate them in appropriate modern contexts.  Hountondji’s latest gesture is curious since both he and Wiredu are supposed to belong to the same philosophic tendency as described by Bodunrin under the rubric of West-led universalism.  However, Wiredu’s attack on tradition is vitiated by his project of conceptual decolonization which, in order to work, requires the recuperation of vital elements in traditional culture.

Wiredu’s stance in relation to modernization and tradition gets refined by his condemnation of some aspects of urban existence which exhibit a manifestation of postmodern environmentalism. First, he writes, “it is quite clear to me that unrestricted industrial urbanization is contrary to any humane culture; it is certainly contrary to our own” (Wiredu, 1980:22). Also, “one of the powerful strains on our extended family system is the very extensive poverty which oppresses out rural populations. Owing to this, people working in the towns and cities are constantly burdened with the financial needs of rural relatives which they usually cannot entirely satisfy”(Wiredu, 1980:22). Contemporary anthropological studies dealing with Africa have dwelt extensively on this phenomenon. The point is, in Africa, forms of sociality exists that can no longer be found in the North Atlantic civilization. If this civilization (the North Atlantic) is characterized by extreme individualism, African forms of social existence on the other hand tend towards the gregarious in which conceptions of generosity, corruption, gratitude, philanthropy, ethnicity  and even justice take on different slightly forms from what obtains within the vastly different North Atlantic context.

Also problematic is Wiredu’s reading of colonialism which is very similar to those of authors such as Ngugi wa Thiongo, Walter Rodney or even Chinua Achebe. In this reading, the colonized is abused, brutalized, silenced and reconstructed against her/his own will.  Colonialism causes the destruction of agency. On de-agentialization, Wiredu states, “any human arrangement is authoritarian if it entails any person being made to do or suffer something against his will, or if it leads to any person being hindered in the development of his own will” (Wiredu, 1980:2).  Homi Bhabha advances the notion of ambivalence to highlight the cultural reciprocities inherent in the entire colonial encounter and structure. This kind of reading of the colonial event has led to a rethinking of colonial theory. But Wiredu’s reading of the colonial encounter is infected by the radical persuasion of early African theorists of decolonization: “The period of colonial struggle was […] a period of cultural affirmation. It was necessary to restore in ourselves our previous confidence which had been so seriously eroded by colonialism. We are still, admittedly, even in post-colonial times, in an era of cultural self-affirmation” (Ibid.59).

5. An African Reading of Karl Marx

Marxist theory and discourse generally provided many African intellectuals with a platform on which to conduct many sociopolitical struggles. In fact, for many African scholars, it served as the only ideological tool. But not all scholars found Marxism acceptable. Wiredu was one of the scholars who has deep reservations about it. But he is not in doubt about the philosophical significance of Marx: “I regard Karl Marx as one of the great philosophers” (Wiredu, 1980:63). Derrida is even more forthcoming on the depth of this significance: “It will always be a fault not to read and reread and discuss Marx- which is to say also a few others- and to go beyond scholarly “reading” or “discussion.” It will be more and more a fault, a failing of theoretical, philosophical, political responsibility” (Derrida, 1994:13). Again, he writes, “the Marxist inheritance was- and still remains, and so it will remain- absolutely and thoroughly determinate. One need not be a Marxist or a communist in order to accept this obvious fact. We all live in a world, some would say a culture, that bears, at an incalculable depth, the mark of this inheritance, whether in a directly visible fashion or not”(Ibid.).

Marxism during era of the Cold War was the major ideological issue and in the present age of neoliberalism it continues to haunt (Derrida’s precise phrase is hauntology) us with its multiple legacies. Wiredu’s critique of Marx and Engels is located within the epoch of the Cold War. But from it, we get a glimpse of not only his political orientation but also his philosophical predilections. For instance, at a point, he claims “the food one eats, the hairstyle one adopts, the amount of money one has, the power one wields- all these and such circumstances are irrelevant from an epistemological point of view” (Wiredu, 1980:66). But Foucault-style analyses have demonstrated that these seemingly marginal activities have a tremendous impact on knowledge/power configurations that are often difficult to ignore. Michel de Certeau has demonstrated these so-called inconsequential acts become significant as gestures of resistance for the benefit of the weak and politically powerless. In his words, “the weak must continually turn to their own ends forces alien to them” (de Certeau 1984: xix). On those specific acts of the weak, he writes, “many everyday practices (talking, reading, moving about, shopping, cooking, etc.) are tactical in character. And so are, more generally, many “ways of operating”: victories of the “weak” over the “strong” (whether the strength be that of powerful people or the violence of things or of an imposed order, etc.), clever tricks, knowing how to get away with things, “hunter’s cunning,” maneuvers, polymorphic simulations, joyful discoveries, poetic  as well as warlike. The Greeks called these “ways of operating” metis (Ibid.). This reading gives an entirely different perspective on acts and themes of resistance as panoptical surveillance in the age of global neoliberalism becomes more totalitarian in nature at specific moments.

As a philosopher versed in analytic philosophy, truth is a primary concern of Wiredu and this concern is incorporated into his analysis of Marxist philosophy. Hence, he identifies the following points, “the cognition of truth is recognized by Engels as the business of philosophy; (2) What is denied is absolute truth, not truth as such; (3) The belief, so finely expressed, in the progressive character of truth; (4) Engels speaks of this process of cognition as the ‘development of science.’ (5) That a consciousness of limitation is a necessary element in all acquired knowledge” (Wiredu,1980:64-65). Wiredu explains that these various Marxian assertions on truth are no different from those of the logician, C. S. Peirce who had expounded them under a formulation he called “fallibilism.” John Dewey also expounded them under the concept of ‘pragmatism’(Ibid.67). So the point here is that some of the main Marxist propositions on truth have parallels in analytic philosophy. Nonetheless, this raises an unsettling question about Marxism and its relation to truth: “How is it that a philosophy which advocates such an admirable doctrine as the humanistic conception of truth tends so often to lead in practice to the suppression of freedom of thought and expression? Is it by accident that this comes to be so? Or is it due to causes internal to the philosophy of Marx and Engels”(Ibid.68). Wiredu demonstrates strong reservations about what Ernest Wamba dia Wamba calls ‘bureaucratic socialism.” Derrida on his part, urges us to distinguish between Marx as a philosopher and the innumerable specters of Marx. In other words, there is a difference between “the dogma machine and the “Marxist” ideological apparatuses (States, parties, cells, unions, and other places of doctrinal production)”(Derrida,1994:13)  and the necessity to treat Marx as a great philosopher. We need to “try to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of classified work” (Ibid.31).  We also need to remember that “he doesn’t belong to the communists, to the Marxists, to the parties, he ought to figure within our great canon of […] political philosophy” (Ibid.31).

Wiredu’s reading of Marxism generally is quite damaging. First, he states, “Engels himself, never perfectly consistent, already compromises his conception of truth with some concessions to absolute truth in Anti-Duhring” (Wiredu, 1980:68). He then makes an even more damaging accusation that a form of authoritarianism lies at the heart of conception of philosophy propagated by Marx and Engels.  On what he considers to a deep-seated confusion in their work, he writes, “Engels recognizes the cognition of truth to be a legitimate business of philosophy and makes a number of excellent points about truth. As soon, however, as one tries to find out what he and Marx conceived philosophy to be like, one is faced with a deep obscurity. The problem resolves round what one may describe as Marx’s conception of philosophy as ideology” (Ibid.70). Here, Wiredu makes the crucial distinction between Marx as a philosopher and the effects of his numerous spectralities and for this reason he offers his most important criticism of his general critique of Marxism. He also accuses Marx of instances of “carelessness in the use of cardinal terms” which he says “may be symptomatic of deep inadequacies of thought”(Ibid.74). This charge, which relates to Marx’s conception of consciousness is indeed serious since it borders on the question of conceptual clarification as advanced by the canon of analytic philosophy. Wiredu argues that Marx and Engels are unclear about their employment of the concept of ideology: “Marx and Engels are […] on the horns of a dilemma. If all philosophical thinking is ideological, then their thinking is ideological and, by their hypothesis, false”(Ibid.76). Wiredu’s insights are very important here: “He and Engels simply assumed for themselves the privilege of exempting their own philosophizing from the ideological theory of ideas”(Ibid.77). Consequently, Marx commits a grave error “in his conception of ideology and its bearing upon philosophy”(Ibid.81).

Another area Wiredu finds Marx and Engels wanting is moral philosophy. In other words, Marx “confused moral philosophy with moralism and assumed rather than argued a moral standpoint”(Ibid.79). Furthermore, he had precious little to say on the nature of the relationship between philosophy and morality. Engels does better on this score as there is a treatment of morality in Anti-Duhring. Nonetheless, Engels is charged with giving “no guidance on the conceptual problems that have perplexed moral philosophers” (Ibi.80). Henceforth, Wiredu becomes increasing dismissive of Marx, Marxism and its followers. First, he writes, “the run-of the-mill Marxists, even less enamoured of philosophical accuracy than their masters, have made the ideological conception of philosophy a battle cry”(Ibid.80). And then he singles out ‘scientific socialism’ which he regards as being unclear in its elaboration and which he typifies as “an amalgam of factual and evaluative elements blended together without regard to categorical stratification”(Ibid.85). In one of his most damaging assessments of Marxism, he declares: “Ideology is the death of philosophy. To the extent to which Marxism, by its own internal incoherences, tends to be transformed into an ideology, to that extent Marxism is a science of the unscientific and a philosophy of the unphilosophic” (Ibid.87).

In sum, Wiredu general attitude towards Marxism is one of condemnation. However, in the contemporary re-evaluations of Marxism a few discursive elements need to be clarified; the inclusion of the demarcation of Cold War and post Cold War assessments of Marxism ought to be employed as an analytical yardstick and also the necessity to sift through the various specters and legacies of Marx as distinct from those of Marxism. This is the kind of reading that Derrida urges us to do and it is also one to which we shall now turn our attention.

Derrida states it is imperative to distinguish between the legacies of Marx and the various spectralities of Marxism. In addition to this distinction we might add another crucial one: analyses of Marxism before and after the fall of the former Soviet Union. Wiredu’s critique is based on the pre-Soviet debacle whilst Derrida’s draws some of his reflections based on the post-Soviet fall. In these two different critiques, we must be careful to always strive to isolate the theoretical elements and insights that bypass short-lived discursive trends and political interests which often tend to vitiate the more profound effects of the works of Karl Marx and those that do not.

The debacle of the former Soviet Union and the apparent hegemony of neoliberal ideology have generated discourses associated with the “ends” of discourse. But Derrida points out that there is nothing new in the contemporary proclamations affirming the end of discourses which are in fact anachronistic when compared to the earlier versions of the same discursive orientation that emerged in the 1950s and which in a vital sense owed a great deal to a certain spirit of Marx: “the eschatological themes of the “end of history,” of the “end of Marxism,” of the “end of philosophy,” of the “ends of man,” of the “last man” and so forth were, in the ‘50s, that is, forty years ago our daily bread. We had this bread of apocalypse in our mouths naturally, already, just as naturally as that which I nicknamed after the fact, in 1980, the “apocalyptic tone in philosophy” (Derrida, 1994:14-15). In a way, in fact the contemporary discourses of endism that draw from the spirit of neoliberal triumphalism, without acknowledging it, are greatly indebted to Marxism and the more constructive critiques of it. Deconstruction, in part, emerged from the necessity to critique the various forms of statist Stalinism, the numerous socio-economic failings of Soviet bureaucracy and the political repression in Hungary. In other words, it emerged partly from the need to organize critiques for degraded forms of socialism.

In speaking about the inheritance of Marx, Derrida also reflects on the injunction associated with it. The task of reflecting on this inheritance and the injunction to which it gives rise is demanding: … “one must filter, sift, criticize, one must sort out several different possibles that inhabit the same injunction. And inhabit it in a contradictory fashion around a secret. If the readability of a legacy were given, natural, transparent, univocal, if it did not call for and at the same time defy interpretation, we would never have anything to inherit from it” (Ibid.16). Derrida’s employment of terms and phrases such “inheritance,” “injunction,” and the “spectrality of the specter” in relation to the legacies of Marx has to do with the question of the genius of Marx: “Whether evil or not, a genius operates, it always resists and defies after the fashion of a spectral thing. The animated work becomes that thing, the Thing that, like an elusive specter, engineers [s’ingenie] a habitation without proper inhabiting, call it is a haunting, of both memory and translation” (Ibid.18).

A work of genius, a masterpiece in addition to giving rise to spectralities also generates legions of imitators and followers. Of the Marxists who came after Marx, Wiredu writes; “I find that Marxists are especially prone to confuse factual with ideological issues. Undoubtedly, the great majority of those who call themselves Marxists do not share the ideology of Marx”(Wiredu,1980:94). In order to transcend the violence and confusion of Marxists who misread Marx, we need “to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of a classified work”(Derrida,1994:31). The work of re-reading Marx, of re-establishing his philosophical value and importance is a task needs to be performed in universities, conferences, colloquia and also in less academic sites and fora.

Within the contemporary cultural moment, new configurations have arisen that were not present during Marx’s day. Indeed, “a set of transformations of all sorts (in particular, techno-scientific-economic-media) exceeds both the traditional givens of the Marxist discourse and those of the liberal discourse opposed to it”(Ibid.70). Also,

Electoral representativity or parliamentary life is not only distorted, as was always the case, by a great number of socio-economic mechanisms, but it is exercised with more and more difficulty in a public space profoundly upset by techno-tele-media apparatuses and by new rhythms of information and communication, by the devices and the speed of forces represented by the latter, but also and consequently by the new modes of appropriation they put to work, by the new structure of the event and of its spectrality that they produce.” (Ibid.79)

Here, the instructive point is that the new information technologies have radically transformed the possibilities of the event and the modes of its production, reception and also interpretation. But there is a far more radical change that has occurred and which signals a profound crisis of global capitalism and the neoliberal ideology that underpins it: “For what must be cried out, at a time when some have the audacity to neo-evangelize in the name of the ideal of liberal democracy that has finally realized itself  as the ideal of human history: never have violence, inequality, exclusion, famine, and thus economic oppression affected as many human beings in the history of the earth and of humanity”(Ibid.85). Also, “never have so many men, women, and children been subjugated, starved, or exterminated on the earth.” (Ibid.)

So Derrida identifies a few new factors that need to be included in the critique of Marxism in the contemporary moment namely the phenomenon of spectralization caused by techno-science and digitalization, the weakening of the practice of liberal democracy and also the crises and multiple contradictions inherent in global capitalism. It is necessary to include another element into the present configuration which is the rise of political Islam as an alternative ideology, its subsequent fervent politicization and its Western reconstruction into an ideology of terror.

Wiredu’s reading of Marx focuses on the conceptual infelicities in the latter’s theorizations of notions such as “ideology,” “consciousness,” and “truth.” Wiredu also criticizes Marx’s project of moral philosophy or in fact the lack of it. On the whole, his reading isn’t complementary. Indeed, it amounts to a dismissal of Marx in spite of the attempt to read him without the obfuscations of innumerable legacies.

6. Conclusion

Arguably, Wiredu’s particular contribution to the debate on the origins, status, problematic and future of contemporary African philosophy resides in his formulations regarding his theory of conceptual decolonization. His approach in formulating this theory of discursive agency and more specifically philosophical practice involves the incorporation of a form bi-culturalism. In other words, his approach entails analyses of the canon of Western philosophy and also the manifestations of tribal cultures as a way of attaining a conceptual synthesis. Indeed, this schema involves a forceful element of bi-culturalism as a matter of logical consequence as well as a high level of [multi] bi-lingual competence. As such, it not only an exercise in conceptual synthesis but it is also a project involving comparative linguistics.

In Anglophone parts of Africa, Wiredu’s experience and research in teaching African philosophy has had a tremendous significance. The positive aspect of this is that the study of African philosophical thought has in positive moments transcended the problematic of identity or what has been termed as the problematic of origins. The less complimentary dimension of this equation is that Wiredu’s discoveries have given rise to (most undoubtedly unwittingly) a somewhat hegemonic school of disciples that is fostering a delimiting academicism and which is contrary to his essential spirit of conceptual inventiveness. As such, it might become necessary not only to critique Wiredu’s corpus but perhaps also Wiredu’s school of disciples which rather than appreciate the originality of his formulations fall instead for the pitfalls of over-ideologization.

Undoubtedly, Wiredu discovered a challenging path in modern African thought in which he sometimes takes the meaning of the existence of African philosophy for granted. In addition, it has been observed that also lacking at some moments in his oeuvre is an attempt to de-totalize and hence particularize the components of what he regards of the foundations of African philosophy.  In other words, African philosophy finds its form, shape and also its conceptual moorings above the discursive platform provided by Western philosophy. In addition, the theoretical space made available for its articulation is derived from the same Western-donated pool of unanimism. Part of recent interrogations of Wiredu’s work includes a questioning of the legitimacy of that space as the only site on which to construct an entire philosophical practice for the alienated, hybrid African consciousness. Oftentimes the question is posed, what are the ways by which the space can be broadened?

Indeed, terms such as reflective integration and due reflection offer the critical spaces for the theoretical articulation of something whose existence has not yet been concretely conceived. So in Wiredu’s corpus we see the very familiar problematic involving the tradition/modernity dichotomy being played out. Finally, it can be argued that this tension is not quite resolved but fortunately it is also a tension that never jeopardizes his philosophical inventiveness. Rather, it seems to animate his reflections in unprecedented ways.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Cronon, D. E. 1955. Black Moses: The Story of Marcus Garvey and the Universal Negro Improvement Association, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cummings, Robert. 1986. “Africa between the Ages” in African Studies Review, Vol. 29, No. 3, September.
  • Diop, Cheikh, Anta, 1974. The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality? Trans. M. Cook, Westport, Conn.: Lawrence Hill.
  • Doortmont, Michel R. 2005 The Pen-Pictures of Modern Africans and African Celebrities by Charles Francis Hutchison,  Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dubow, Saul. 2000 The African National Congress, Johannesburg: Jonathan Ball.
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1994. Specters of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, & the new international, trans. Peggy Kamuf, New York: Routledge.
  • Gates Jr., H. L. 1992. Loose Canons, New York: OxfordUniversity Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1967 Black Skin, White Masks (trans. C. Van Markmann) New York: Grove Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1963 The Wretched of the Earth, London: Penguin.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1974 The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1977 Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans A. M. Sheridan-Smith. London: Allen Lane.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1980 Language, Counter-Memory and Practice. Selected Essays and Interviews. Ed. Donald Bouchard, Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1982 The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1991 “Governmentality” in G. Burchell, C. Gordon and P. Miller, eds, The Foucault Effect.Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. 1983 African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, London: Hutchinson and Co.
  • Hountondji, Paulin.  2002 The Struggle for Meaning: Reflections on Philosophy, Culture and Democracy in Africa, Athens: Ohio University Center for International Studies.
  • Masolo, D.A. 1994 African Philosophy in Search of Identity Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1988 The Invention of Africa Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1994. The Idea of Africa,Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Oladipo,  Olusegun. ed. 2002  The Third Way in African Philosophy:Essays in Honour of Kwasi WireduIbadan: Hope Publications Ltd.
  • Osha, Sanya, 2005 Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa, Dakar: Codesria.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1976 Myth, Literature and the African World Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole,   1988 Art, Dialogue and Outrage Ibadan: New Horn Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1996 The Open Sore of a Continent New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole.  1999 The Burden of Memory, The Muse of Forgiveness New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole. 2000 “Memory, Truth and Healing” in The Politics of Memory, Truth, Healing and Social Justice, eds. I. Amaduime and A. An-Na’im, London: Zed Books
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1972 HomecomingLondon, Ibadan, Lusaka: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1981 Writers in PoliticsNairobi: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1986 Decolonising the MindNairobi: E.A.E.P.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1993 Moving the CentreLondon: James Currey.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Philosophy and an African CultureCambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1980.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1983 “The Akan Concept of Mind” in Ibadan Journal of Humanistic Studies, No. 3.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1985 “The Concept of Truth in Akan Language” in P.O. Bodunrin ed. Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Ile-Ife: University of Ife Press.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. and Gyekye, Kwame. 1992 Persons and Community. Washington, D.C.: The Council for Research in Values and Philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1993 “Canons of Conceptualisation” in The Monist: An International Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry Vol. 76, No. 4 October.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1995 Conceptual Decolonization in African PhilosophyIbadan: Hope Publications.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1996 Cultural Universals and ParticularsBloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Yai, Olabiyi. 1977 “The Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy,” Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.VI, No.2.


Author Information

Sanya Osha
Tshwane University of Technology
South Africa

Xenophon (430—354 B.C.E.)