Category Archives: History of Philosophy

Socrates (469—399 B.C.E.)

SocratesSocrates is one of the few individuals whom one could say has so-shaped the cultural and intellectual development of the world that, without him, history would be profoundly different.  He is best known for his association with the Socratic method of question and answer, his claim that he was ignorant (or aware of his own absence of knowledge), and his claim that the unexamined life is not worth living, for human beings. He was the inspiration for Plato, the thinker widely held to be the founder of the Western philosophical tradition.  Plato in turn served as the teacher of Aristotle, thus establishing the famous triad of ancient philosophers: Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle.  Unlike other philosophers of his time and ours, Socrates never wrote anything down but was committed to living simply and to interrogating the everyday views and popular opinions of those in his home city of Athens.  At the age of 70, he was put to death at the hands of his fellow citizens on charges of impiety and corruption of the youth.  His trial, along with the social and political context in which occurred, has warranted as much treatment from historians and classicists as his arguments and methods have from philosophers.

This article gives an overview of Socrates: who he was, what he thought, and his purported method.  It is both historical and philosophical.  At the same time, it contains reflections on the difficult nature of knowing anything about a person who never committed any of his ideas to the written word.  Much of what is known about Socrates comes to us from Plato, although Socrates appears in the works of other ancient writers as well as those who follow Plato in the history of philosophy.  This article recognizes that finding the original Socrates may be impossible, but it attempts to achieve a close approximation.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography: Who was Socrates?
    1. The Historical Socrates
      1. Birth and Early Life
      2. Later Life and Trial
        1. The Peloponnesian War and the Threat to Democracy
        2. Greek Religion and Socrates’ Impiety
    2. The Socratic Problem: the Philosophical Socrates
      1. Origin of the Socratic Problem
      2. Aristophanes
      3. Xenophon
      4. Plato
      5. Aristotle
  2. Content: What does Socrates Think?
    1. Presocratic Philosophy and the Sophists
    2. Socratic Themes in Plato’s Apology
      1. Socratic Ignorance
      2. Priority of the Care of the Soul
      3. The Unexamined Life
    3. Other Socratic Positions and Arguments
      1. Unity of Virtue; All Virtue is Knowledge
      2. No One Errs Knowingly/No One Errs Willingly
      3. All Desire is for the Good
      4. It is Better to Suffer an Injustice Than to Commit One
      5. Eudaimonism
      6. Ruling is An Expertise
    4. Socrates the Ironist
  3. Method: How Did Socrates Do Philosophy?
    1. The Elenchus: Socrates the Refuter
      1. Topic
      2. Purpose
    2. Maieutic: Socrates the Midwife
    3. Dialectic: Socrates the Constructer
  4. Legacy: How Have Other Philosophers Understood Socrates?
    1. Hellenistic Philosophy
      1. The Cynics
      2. The Stoics
      3. The Skeptics
      4. The Epicureans
      5. The Peripatetics
    2. Modern Philosophy
      1. Hegel
      2. Kierkegaard
      3. Nietzsche
      4. Heidegger
      5. Gadamer
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biography: Who was Socrates?

a. The Historical Socrates

i. Birth and Early Life

Socrates was born in Athens in the year 469 B.C.E. to Sophroniscus, a stonemason, and Phaenarete, a midwife.  His family was not extremely poor, but they were by no means wealthy, and Socrates could not claim that he was of noble birth like Plato.  He grew up in the political deme or district of Alopece, and when he turned 18, began to perform the typical political duties required of Athenian males.  These included compulsory military service and membership in the Assembly, the governing body responsible for determining military strategy and legislation.

In a culture that worshipped male beauty, Socrates had the misfortune of being born incredibly ugly.  Many of our ancient sources attest to his rather awkward physical appearance, and Plato more than once makes reference to it (Theaetetus 143e, Symposium, 215a-c; also Xenophon Symposium 4.19, 5.5-7 and Aristophanes Clouds 362).  Socrates was exophthalmic, meaning that his eyes bulged out of his head and were not straight but focused sideways.  He had a snub nose, which made him resemble a pig, and many sources depict him with a potbelly.  Socrates did little to help his odd appearance, frequently wearing the same cloak and sandals throughout both the day and the evening.  Plato’s Symposium (174a) offers us one of the few accounts of his caring for his appearance.

As a young man Socrates was given an education appropriate for a person of his station.  By the middle of the 5th century B.C.E., all Athenian males were taught to read and write. Sophroniscus, however, also took pains to give his son an advanced cultural education in poetry, music, and athletics.  In both Plato and Xenophon, we find a Socrates that is well versed in poetry, talented at music, and quite at-home in the gymnasium.  In accordance with Athenian custom, his father also taught him a trade, though Socrates did not labor at it on a daily basis.  Rather, he spent his days in the agora (the Athenian marketplace), asking questions of those who would speak with him.  While he was poor, he quickly acquired a following of rich young aristocrats—one of whom was Plato—who particularly enjoyed hearing him interrogate those that were purported to be the wisest and most influential men in the city.

Socrates was married to Xanthippe, and according to some sources, had a second wife.  Most suggest that he first married Xanthippe, and that she gave birth to his first son, Lamprocles.  He is alleged to have married his second wife, Myrto, without dowry, and she gave birth to his other two sons, Sophroniscus and Menexenus.  Various accounts attribute Sophroniscus to Xanthippe, while others even suggest that Socrates was married to both women simultaneously because of a shortage of males in Athens at the time.  In accordance with Athenian custom, Socrates was open about his physical attraction to young men, though he always subordinated his physical desire for them to his desire that they improve the condition of their souls.

Socrates fought valiantly during his time in the Athenian military.  Just before the Peloponnesian War with Sparta began in 431 B.C.E, he helped the Athenians win the battle of Potidaea (432 B.C.E.), after which he saved the life of Alcibiades, the famous Athenian general.  He also fought as one of 7,000 hoplites aside 20,000 troops at the battle of Delium (424 B.C.E.) and once more at the battle of Amphipolis (422 B.C.E.).  Both battles were defeats for Athens.

Despite his continued service to his city, many members of Athenian society perceived Socrates to be a threat to their democracy, and it is this suspicion that largely contributed to his conviction in court.  It is therefore imperative to understand the historical context in which his trial was set.

ii. Later Life and Trial

1. The Peloponnesian War and the Threat to Democracy

Between 431—404 B.C.E. Athens fought one of its bloodiest and most protracted conflicts with neighboring Sparta, the war that we now know as the Peloponnesian War.  Aside from the fact that Socrates fought in the conflict, it is important for an account of his life and trial because many of those with whom Socrates spent his time became either sympathetic to the Spartan cause at the very least or traitors to Athens at worst.  This is particularly the case with those from the more aristocratic Athenian families, who tended to favor the rigid and restricted hierarchy of power in Sparta instead of the more widespread democratic distribution of power and free speech to all citizens that obtained in Athens.  Plato more than once places in the mouth of his character Socrates praise for Sparta (Protagoras 342b, Crito 53a; cf. Republic 544c in which most people think the Spartan constitution is the best).  The political regime of the Republic is marked by a small group of ruling elites that preside over the citizens of the ideal city.

There are a number of important historical moments throughout the war leading up to Socrates’ trial that figure in the perception of him as a traitor.  Seven years after the battle of Amphipolis, the Athenian navy was set to invade the island of Sicily, when a number of statues in the city called “herms”, dedicated to the god Hermes, protector of travelers, were destroyed.  Dubbed the ‘Mutilation of the Herms’ (415 B.C.E.), this event engendered not only a fear of those who might seek to undermine the democracy, but those who did not respect the gods.  In conjunction with these crimes, Athens witnessed the profanation of the Eleusinian mysteries, religious rituals that were to be conducted only in the presence of priests but that were in this case performed in private homes without official sanction or recognition of any kind.  Amongst those accused and persecuted on suspicion of involvement in the crimes were a number of Socrates’ associates, including Alcibiades, who was recalled from his position leading the expedition in Sicily.  Rather than face prosecution for the crime, Alcibiades escaped and sought asylum in Sparta.

Though Alcibiades was not the only of Socrates’ associates implicated in the sacrilegious crimes (Charmides and Critias were suspected as well), he is arguably the most important.  Socrates had by many counts been in love with Alcibiades and Plato depicts him pursuing or speaking of his love for him in many dialogues (Symposium 213c-d, Protagoras 309a, Gorgias 481d, Alcibiades I 103a-104c, 131e-132a).  Alcibiades is typically portrayed as a wandering soul (Alcibiades I 117c-d), not committed to any one consistent way of life or definition of justice.  Instead, he was a kind of cameleon-like flatterer that could change and mold himself in order to please crowds and win political favor (Gorgias 482a).  In 411 B.C.E., a group of citizens opposed to the Athenian democracy led a coup against the government in hopes of establishing an oligarchy.  Though the democrats put down the coup later that year and recalled Alcibiades to lead the Athenian fleet in the Hellespont, he aided the oligarchs by securing for them an alliance with the Persian satraps.  Alcibiades therefore did not just aid the Spartan cause but allied himself with Persian interests as well.  His association with the two principal enemies of Athens reflected poorly on Socrates, and Xenophon tells us that Socrates’ repeated association with and love for Alcibiades was instrumental in the suspicion that he was a Spartan apologist.

Sparta finally defeated Athens in 404 B.C.E., just five years before Socrates’ trial and execution.  Instead of a democracy, they installed as rulers a small group of Athenians who were loyal to Spartan interests.  Known as “The Thirty” or sometimes as the “Thirty Tyrants”, they were led by Critias, a known associate of Socrates and a member of his circle.  Critias’ nephew Charmides, about whom we have a Platonic dialogue of the same name, was also a member.  Though Critias put forth a law prohibiting Socrates from conducting discussions with young men under the age of 30, Socrates’ earlier association with him—as well as his willingness to remain in Athens and endure the rule of the Thirty rather than flee—further contributed to the growing suspicion that Socrates was opposed to the democratic ideals of his city.

The Thirty ruled tyrannically—executing a number of wealthy Athenians as well as confiscating their property, arbitrarily arresting those with democratic sympathies, and exiling many others—until they were overthrown in 403 B.C.E. by a group of democratic exiles returning to the city.  Both Critias and Charmides were killed and, after a Spartan-sponsored peace accord, the democracy was restored.  The democrats proclaimed a general amnesty in the city and thereby prevented politically motivated legal prosecutions aimed at redressing the terrible losses incurred during the reign of the Thirty.  Their hope was to maintain unity during the reestablishment of their democracy.

One of Socrates’ main accusers, Anytus, was one of the democratic exiles that returned to the city to assist in the overthrow of the Thirty.  Plato’s Meno, set in the year 402 B.C.E., imagines a conversation between Socrates and Anytus in which the latter argues that any citizen of Athens can teach virtue, an especially democratic view insofar as it assumes knowledge of how to live well is not the restricted domain of the esoteric elite or privileged few.  In the discussion, Socrates argues that if one wants to know about virtue, one should consult an expert on virtue (Meno 91b-94e).  The political turmoil of the city, rebuilding itself as a democracy after nearly thirty years of destruction and bloodshed, constituted a context in which many citizens were especially fearful of threats to their democracy that came not from the outside, but from within their own city.

While many of his fellow citizens found considerable evidence against Socrates, there was also historical evidence in addition to his military service for the case that he was not just a passive but an active supporter of the democracy.  For one thing, just as he had associates that were known oligarchs, he also had associates that were supporters of the democracy, including the metic family of Cephalus and Socrates’ friend Chaerephon, the man who reported that the oracle at Delphi had proclaimed that no man was wiser than Socrates.  Additionally, when he was ordered by the Thirty to help retrieve the democratic general Leon from the island of Salamis for execution, he refused to do so.  His refusal could be understood not as the defiance of a legitimately established government but rather his allegiance to the ideals of due process that were in effect under the previously instituted democracy.  Indeed, in Plato’s Crito, Socrates refuses to escape from prison on the grounds that he lived his whole life with an implied agreement with the laws of the democracy (Crito 50a-54d).  Notwithstanding these facts, there was profound suspicion that Socrates was a threat to the democracy in the years after the end of the Peloponnesian War.  But because of the amnesty, Anytus and his fellow accusers Meletus and Lycon were prevented from bringing suit against Socrates on political grounds.  They opted instead for religious grounds.

2. Greek Religion and Socrates’ Impiety

Because of the amnesty the charges made against Socrates were framed in religious terms.  As recounted by Diogenes Laertius (1.5.40), the charges were stated as follows: “Socrates does criminal wrong by not recognizing the gods that the city recognizes, and furthermore by introducing new divinities; and he also does criminal wrong by corrupting the youth” (other accounts: Xenophon Memorabilia I.I.1 and Apology 11-12, Plato, Apology 24b and Euthyphro 2c-3b).  Many people understood the charge about corrupting the youth to signify that Socrates taught his subversive views to others, a claim that he adamantly denies in his defense speech by claiming that he has no wisdom to teach (Plato, Apology 20c) and that he cannot be held responsible for the actions of those that heard him speak (Plato, Apology 33a-c).

It is now customary to refer to the principal written accusation on the deposition submitted to the Athenian court as an accusation of impiety, or unholiness.  Rituals, ceremonies, and sacrifices that were officially sanctioned by the city and its officials marked ancient Greek religion.  The sacred was woven into the everyday experience of citizens who demonstrated their piety by correctly observing their ancestral traditions.  Interpretation of the gods at their temples was the exclusive domain of priests appointed and recognized by the city.  The boundary and separation between the religious and the secular that we find in many countries today therefore did not obtain in Athens.  A religious crime was consequently an offense not just against the gods, but also against the city itself.

Socrates and his contemporaries lived in a polytheistic society, a society in which the gods did not create the world but were themselves created.  Socrates would have been brought up with the stories of the gods recounted in Hesiod and Homer, in which the gods were not omniscient, omnibenevolent, or eternal, but rather power-hungry super-creatures that regularly intervened in the affairs of human beings.  One thinks for example of Aphrodite saving Paris from death at the hands of Menelaus (Homer, Iliad 3.369-382) or Zeus sending Apollo to rescue the corpse of Sarpedon after his death in battle (Homer, Iliad 16.667-684).  Human beings were to fear the gods, sacrifice to them, and honor them with festivals and prayers.

Socrates instead seemed to have a conception of the divine as always benevolent, truthful, authoritative, and wise.  For him, divinity always operated in accordance with the standards of rationality.  This conception of divinity, however, dispenses with the traditional conception of prayer and sacrifice as motivated by hopes for material payoff.  Socrates’ theory of the divine seemed to make the most important rituals and sacrifices in the city entirely useless, for if the gods are all good, they will benefit human beings regardless of whether or not human beings make offerings to them.  Jurors at his trial might have thought that, without the expectation of material reward or protection from the gods, Socrates was disconnecting religion from its practical roots and its connection with the civic identity of the city.

While Socrates was critical of blind acceptance of the gods and the myths we find in Hesiod and Homer, this in itself was not unheard of in Athens at the time.  Solon, Xenophanes, Heraclitus, and Euripides had all spoken against the capriciousness and excesses of the gods without incurring penalty.  It is possible to make the case that Socrates’ jurors might not have indicted him solely on questioning the gods or even of interrogating the true meaning of piety.  Indeed, there was no legal definition of piety in Athens at the time, and jurors were therefore in a similar situation to the one in which we find Socrates in Plato’s Euthyphro, that is, in need of an inquiry into what the nature of piety truly is.  What seems to have concerned the jurors was not only Socrates’ challenge to the traditional interpretation of the gods of the city, but his seeming allegiance to an entirely novel divine being, unfamiliar to anyone in the city.

This new divine being is what is known as Socrates’ daimon.  Though it has become customary to think of a daimon as a spirit or quasi-divinity (for example, Symposium 202e-203a), in ancient Greek religion it was not solely a specific class of divine being but rather a mode of activity, a force that drives a person when no particular divine agent can be named (Burkett, 180).  Socrates claimed to have heard a sign or voice from his days as a child that accompanied him and forbid him to pursue certain courses of action (Plato, Apology 31c-d, 40a-b, Euthydemus 272e-273a, Euthyphro 3b, Phaedrus 242b, Theages 128-131a, Theaetetus 150c-151b, Rep 496c; Xenophon, Apology 12, Memorabilia 1.1.3-5).  Xenophon adds that the sign also issued positive commands (Memorablia 1.1.4, 4.3.12, 4.8.1, Apology 12).  This sign was accessible only to Socrates, private and internal to his own mind.  Whether Socrates received moral knowledge of any sort from the sign is a matter of scholarly debate, but beyond doubt is the strangeness of Socrates’ insistence that he took private instructions from a deity that was unlicensed by the city.  For all the jurors knew, the deity could have been hostile to Athenian interests.  Socrates’ daimon was therefore extremely influential in his indictment on the charge of worshipping new gods unknown to the city (Plato, Euthyphro 3b, Xenophon, Memorabilia I.1.2).

Whereas in Plato’s Apology Socrates makes no attempt to reconcile his divine sign with traditional views of piety, Xenophon’s Socrates argues that just as there are those who rely on birdcalls and receive guidance from voices, so he too is influenced by his daimon.  However, Socrates had no officially sanctioned religious role in the city.  As such, his attempt to assimilate himself to a seer or necromancer appointed by the city to interpret divine signs actually may have undermined his innocence, rather than help to establish it.  His insistence that he had direct, personal access to the divine made him appear guilty to enough jurors that he was sentenced to death.

b. The Socratic Problem: the Philosophical Socrates

The Socratic problem is the problem faced by historians of philosophy when attempting to reconstruct the ideas of the original Socrates as distinct from his literary representations.  While we know many of the historical details of Socrates’ life and the circumstances surrounding his trial, Socrates’ identity as a philosopher is much more difficult to establish.  Because he wrote nothing, what we know of his ideas and methods comes to us mainly from his contemporaries and disciples.

There were a number of Socrates’ followers who wrote conversations in which he appears.  These works are what are known as the logoi sokratikoi, or Socratic accounts.  Aside from Plato and Xenophon, most of these dialogues have not survived.  What we know of them comes to us from other sources.  For example, very little survives from the dialogues of Antisthenes, whom Xenophon reports as one of Socrates’ leading disciples.  Indeed, from polemics written by the rhetor Isocrates, some scholars have concluded that he was the most prominent Socratic in Athens for the first decade following Socrates’ death.  Diogenes Laertius (6.10-13) attributes to Antisthenes a number of views that we recognize as Socratic, including that virtue is sufficient for happiness, the wise man is self-sufficient, only the virtuous are noble, the virtuous are friends, and good things are morally fine and bad things are base.

Aeschines of Sphettus wrote seven dialogues, all of which have been lost.  It is possible for us to reconstruct the plots of two of them: the Alcibiades—in which Socrates shames Alcibiades into admitting he needs Socrates’ help to be virtuous—and the Aspasia—in which Socrates recommends the famous wife of Pericles as a teacher for the son of Callias.  Aeschines’ dialogues focus on Socrates’ ability to help his interlocutor acquire self-knowledge and better himself.

Phaedo of Elis wrote two dialogues.  His central use of Socrates is to show that philosophy can improve anyone regardless of his social class or natural talents.  Euclides of Megara wrote six dialogues, about which we know only their titles.  Diogenes Laertius reports that he held that the good is one, that insight and prudence are different names for the good, and that what is opposed to the good does not exist.  All three are Socratic themes.  Lastly, Aristippus of Cyrene wrote no Socratic dialogues but is alleged to have written a work entitled To Socrates.

The two Socratics on whom most of our philosophical understanding of Socrates depends are Plato and Xenophon.  Scholars also rely on the works of the comic playwright Aristophanes and Plato’s most famous student, Aristotle.

i. Origin of the Socratic Problem

The Socratic problem first became pronounced in the early 19th century with the influential work of Friedrich Schleiermacher.  Until this point, scholars had largely turned to Xenophon to identify what the historical Socrates thought.  Schleiermacher argued that Xenophon was not a philosopher but rather a simple citizen-soldier, and that his Socrates was so dull and philosophically uninteresting that, reading Xenophon alone, it would be difficult to understand the reputation accorded Socrates by so many of his contemporaries and nearly all the schools of philosophy that followed him.  The better portrait of Socrates, Schleiermacher claimed, comes to us from Plato.

Though many scholars have since jettisoned Xenophon as a legitimate source for representing the philosophical views of the historical Socrates, they remain divided over the reliability of the other three sources.  For one thing, Aristophanes was a comic playwright, and therefore took considerable poetic license when scripting his characters.  Aristotle, born 15 years after Socrates’ death, hears about Socrates primarily from Plato. Plato himself wrote dialogues or philosophical dramas, and thus cannot be understood to be presenting his readers with exact replicas or transcriptions of conversations that Socrates actually had.  Furthermore, many scholars think that Plato’s so-called middle and late dialogues do not present the views of the historical Socrates.

We therefore see the difficult nature of the Socratic problem: because we don’t seem to have any consistently reliable sources, finding the true Socrates or the original Socrates proves to be an impossible task.  What we are left with, instead, is a composite picture assembled from various literary and philosophical components that give us what we might think of as Socratic themes or motifs.

ii. Aristophanes

Born in 450 B.C.E., Aristophanes wrote a number of comic plays intended to satirize and caricature many of his fellow Athenians.  His Clouds (423 B.C.E.) was so instrumental in parodying Socrates and painting him as a dangerous intellectual capable of corrupting the entire city that Socrates felt compelled in his trial defense to allude to the bad reputation he acquired as a result of the play (Plato, Apology 18a-b, 19c).  Aristophanes was much closer in age to Socrates than Plato and Xenophon, and as such is the only one of our sources exposed to Socrates in his younger years.

In the play, Socrates is the head of a phrontistêrion, a school of learning where students are taught the nature of the heavens and how to win court cases.  Socrates appears in a swing high above the stage, purportedly to better study the heavens.  His patron deities, the clouds, represent his interest in meteorology and may also symbolize the lofty nature of reasoning that may take either side of an argument.  The main plot of the play centers on an indebted man called Strepsiades, whose son Phidippides ends up in the school to learn how to help his father avoid paying off his debts.  By the end of the play, Phidippides has beaten his father, arguing that it is perfectly reasonable to do so on the grounds that, just as it is acceptable for a father to spank his son for his own good, so it is acceptable for a son to hit a father for his own good.  In addition to the theme that Socrates corrupts the youth, we therefore also find in the Clouds the origin of the rumor that Socrates makes the stronger argument the weaker and the weaker argument the stronger.  Indeed, the play features a personification of the Stronger Argument—which represents traditional education and values—attacked by the Weaker Argument—which advocates a life of pleasure.

While the Clouds is Aristophanes’ most famous and comprehensive attack on Socrates, Socrates appears in other of his comedies as well.  In the Birds (414 B.C.E.), Aristophanes coins a Greek verb based on Socrates’ name to insinuate that Socrates was truly a Spartan sympathizer (1280-83).  Young men who were found “Socratizing” were expressing their admiration of Sparta and its customs.  And in the Frogs (405), the Chorus claims that it is not refined to keep company with Socrates, who ignores the poets and wastes time with ‘frivolous words’ and ‘pompous word-scraping’ (1491-1499).

Aristophanes’ Socrates is a kind of variegated caricature of trends and new ideas emerging in Athens that he believed were threatening to the city.  We find a number of such themes prevalent in Presocratic philosophy and the teachings of the Sophists, including those about natural science, mathematics, social science, ethics, political philosophy, and the art of words.  Amongst other things, Aristophanes was troubled by the displacement of the divine through scientific explanations of the world and the undermining of traditional morality and custom by explanations of cultural life that appealed to nature instead of the gods.  Additionally, he was reticent about teaching skill in disputation, for fear that a clever speaker could just as easily argue for the truth as argue against it.  These issues constitute what is sometimes called the “new learning” developing in 5th century B.C.E. Athens, for which the Aristophanic Socrates is the iconic symbol.

iii. Xenophon

Born in the same decade as Plato (425 B.C.E.), Xenophon lived in the political deme of Erchia.  Though he knew Socrates he would not have had as much contact with him as Plato did.  He was not present in the courtroom on the day of Socrates’ trial, but rather heard an account of it later on from Hermogenes, a member of Socrates’ circle.  His depiction of Socrates is found principally in four works: Apology—in which Socrates gives a defense of his life before his jurors—Memorabilia—in which Xenophon himself explicates the charges against Socrates and tries to defend him—Symposium—a conversation between Socrates and his friends at a drinking party—and Oeconomicus—a Socratic discourse on estate management.  Socrates also appears in Xenophon’s Hellenica and Anabasis.

Xenophon’s reputation as a source on the life and ideas of Socrates is one on which scholars do not always agree.  Largely thought to be a significant source of information about Socrates before the 19th century, for most of the 20th century Xenophon’s ability to depict Socrates as a philosopher was largely called into question.  Following Schleiermacher, many argued that Xenophon himself was either a bad philosopher who did not understand Socrates, or not a philosopher at all, more concerned with practical, everyday matters like economics.  However, recent scholarship has sought to challenge this interpretation, arguing that it assumes an understanding of philosophy as an exclusively speculative and critical endeavor that does not attend to the ancient conception of philosophy as a comprehensive way of life.

While Plato will likely always remain the principal source on Socrates and Socratic themes, Xenophon’s Socrates is distinct in philosophically interesting ways.  He emphasizes the values of self-mastery (enkrateia), endurance of physical pain (karteria), and self-sufficiency (autarkeia).  For Xenophon’s Socrates, self-mastery or moderation is the foundation of virtue (Memorabilia, 1.5.4).  Whereas in Plato’s Apology the oracle tells Chaerephon that no one is wiser than Socrates, in Xenophon’s Apology Socrates claims that the oracle told Chaerephon that “no man was more free than I, more just, and more moderate” (Xenophon, Apology, 14).

Part of Socrates’ freedom consists in his freedom from want, precisely because he has mastered himself.  As opposed to Plato’s Socrates, Xenophon’s Socrates is not poor, not because he has much, but because he needs little.  Oeconomicus 11.3 for instance shows Socrates displeased with those who think him poor.  One can be rich even with very little on the condition that one has limited his needs, for wealth is just the excess of what one has over what one requires.  Socrates is rich because what he has is sufficient for what he needs (Memorabilia 1.2.1, 1.3.5, 4.2.38-9).

We also find Xenophon attributing to Socrates a proof of the existence of God.  The argument holds that human beings are the product of an intelligent design, and we therefore should conclude that there is a God who is the maker (dēmiourgos) or designer of all things (Memorabilia 1.4.2-7).  God creates a systematically ordered universe and governs it in the way our minds govern our bodies (Memorabilia 1.4.1-19, 4.3.1-18).  While Plato’s Timaeus tells the story of a dēmiourgos creating the world, it is Timaeus, not Socrates, who tells the story.  Indeed, Socrates speaks only sparingly at the beginning of the dialogue, and most scholars do not count as Socratic the cosmological arguments therein.

iv. Plato

Plato was Socrates’ most famous disciple, and the majority of what most people know about Socrates is known about Plato’s Socrates.  Plato was born to one of the wealthiest and politically influential families in Athens in 427 B.C.E., the son of Ariston and Perictione. His brothers were Glaucon and Adeimantus, who are Socrates’ principal interlocutors for the majority of the Republic.  Though Socrates is not present in every Platonic dialogue, he is in the majority of them, often acting as the main interlocutor who drives the conversation.

The attempt to extract Socratic views from Plato’s texts is itself a notoriously difficult problem, bound up with questions about the order in which Plato composed his dialogues, one’s methodological approach to reading them, and whether or not Socrates, or anyone else for that matter, speaks for Plato.  Readers interested in the details of this debate should consult “Plato.”  Generally speaking, the predominant view of Plato’s Socrates in the English-speaking world from the middle to the end of the 20th century was simply that he was Plato’s mouthpiece.  In other words, anything Socrates says in the dialogues is what Plato thought at the time he wrote the dialogue.  This view, put forth by the famous Plato scholar Gregory Vlastos, has been challenged in recent years, with some scholars arguing that Plato has no mouthpiece in the dialogues (see Cooper xxi-xxiii).  While we can attribute to Plato certain doctrines that are consistent throughout his corpus, there is no reason to think that Socrates, or any other speaker, always and consistently espouses these doctrines.

The main interpretive obstacle for those seeking the views of Socrates from Plato is the question of the order of the dialogues.  Thrasyllus, the 1st century (C.E.) Platonist who was the first to arrange the dialogues according to a specific paradigm, organized the dialogues into nine tetralogies, or groups of four, on the basis of the order in which he believed they should be read.  Another approach, customary for most scholars by the late 20th century, groups the dialogues into three categories on the basis of the order in which Plato composed them.  Plato begins his career, so the narrative goes, representing his teacher Socrates in typically short conversations about ethics, virtue, and the best human life.  These are “early” dialogues.  Only subsequently does Plato develop his own philosophical views—the most famous of which is the doctrine of the Forms or Ideas—that Socrates defends.  These “middle” dialogues put forth positive doctrines that are generally thought to be Platonic and not Socratic. Finally, towards the end of his life, Plato composes dialogues in which Socrates typically either hardly features at all or is altogether absent.  These are the “late” dialogues.

There are a number of complications with this interpretive thesis, and many of them focus on the portrayal of Socrates.  Though the Gorgias is an early dialogue, Socrates concludes the dialogue with a myth that some scholars attribute to a Pythagorean influence on Plato that he would not have had during Socrates’ lifetime.  Though the Parmenides is a middle dialogue, the younger Socrates speaks only at the beginning before Parmenides alone speaks for the remainder of the dialogue.  While the Philebus is a late dialogue, Socrates is the main speaker.  Some scholars identify the Meno as an early dialogue because Socrates refutes Meno’s attempts to articulate the nature of virtue.  Others, focusing on Socrates’ use of the theory of recollection and the method of hypothesis, argue that it is a middle dialogue.  Finally, while Plato’s most famous work the Republic is a middle dialogue, some scholars make a distinction within the Republic itself.  The first book, they argue, is Socratic, because in it we find Socrates refuting Thrasymachus’ definition of justice while maintaining that he knows nothing about justice.  The rest of the dialogue they claim, with its emphasis on the division of the soul and the metaphysics of the Forms, is Platonic.

To discern a consistent Socrates in Plato is therefore a difficult task.  Instead of speaking about chronology of composition, contemporary scholars searching for views that are likely to have been associated with the historical Socrates generally focus on a group of dialogues that are united by topical similarity.  These “Socratic dialogues” feature Socrates as the principal speaker, challenging his interlocutor to elaborate on and critically examine his own views while typically not putting forth substantive claims of his own.  These dialogues—including those that some scholars think are not written by Plato and those that most scholars agree are not written by Plato but that Thrasyllus included in his collection—are as follows: Euthyphro, Apology, Crito, Alcibiades I, Alcibiades II, Hipparchus, Rival Lovers, Theages, Charmides, Laches, Lysis, Euthydemus, Protagoras, Gorgias, Meno, Greater Hippias, Lesser Hippias, Ion, Menexenus, Clitophon, Minos.  Some of the more famous positions Socrates defends in these dialogues are covered in the content section.

v. Aristotle

Aristotle was born in 384 B.C.E., fifteen 15 years after the death of Socrates.  At the age of eighteen, he went to study at Plato’s Academy, and remained there for twenty years.  Afterwards, he traveled throughout Asia and was invited by Phillip II of Macedon to tutor his son Alexander, known to history as Alexander the Great.  While Aristotle would never have had the chance to meet Socrates, we have in his writings an account of both Socrates’ method and the topics about which he had conversations.  Given the likelihood that Aristotle heard about Socrates from Plato and those at his Academy, it is not surprising that most of what he says about Socrates follows the depiction of him in the Platonic dialogues.

Aristotle related four concrete points about Socrates.  The first is that Socrates asked questions without supplying an answer of his own, because he claimed to know nothing (De Elenchis Sophisticus 1836b6-8).  The picture of Socrates here is consistent with that of Plato’s Apology.  Second, Aristotle claims that Socrates never asked questions about nature, but concerned himself only with ethical questions.  Aristotle thus attributes to the historical Socrates both the method and topics we find in Plato’s Socratic dialogues.

Third, Aristotle claims that Socrates is the first to have employed epagōgē, a word typically rendered in English as “induction.”  This translation, however, is misleading, lest we impute to Socrates a preference for inductive reasoning as opposed to deductive reasoning.  The term better indicates that Socrates was fond or arguing via the use of analogy.  For instance, just as a doctor does not practice medicine for himself but for the best interest of his patient, so the ruler in the city takes no account of his own personal profit, but is rather interested in caring for his citizens (Republic 342d-e).

The fourth and final claim Aristotle makes about Socrates itself has two parts.  First, Socrates was the first to ask the question, ti esti: what is it?  For example, if someone were to suggest to Socrates that our children should grow up to be courageous, he would ask, what is courage?  That is, what is the universal definition or nature that holds for all examples of courage?  Second, as distinguished from Plato, Socrates did not separate universals from their particular instantiations.  For Plato, the noetic object, the knowable thing, is the separate universal, not the particular.  Socrates simply asked the “what is it” question (on this and the previous two points, see Metaphysics I.6.987a29-b14; cf. b22-24, b27-33, and see XIII.4.1078b12-34).

2. Content: What does Socrates Think?

Given the nature of these sources, the task of recounting what Socrates thought is not an easy one.  Nonetheless, reading Plato’s Apology, it is possible to articulate a number of what scholars today typically associate with Socrates.  Plato the author has his Socrates claim that Plato was present in the courtroom for Socrates’ defense (Apology 34a), and while this cannot mean that Plato records the defense as a word for word transcription, it is the closest thing we have to an account of what Socrates actually said at a concrete point in his life.

a. Presocratic Philosophy and the Sophists

Socrates opens his defense speech by defending himself against his older accusers (Apology 18a), claiming they have poisoned the minds of his jurors since they were all young men.  Amongst these accusers was Aristophanes.  In addition to the claim that Socrates makes the worse argument into the stronger, there is a rumor that Socrates idles the day away talking about things in the sky and below the earth.  His reply is that he never discusses such topics (Apology 18a-c).  Socrates is distinguishing himself here not just from the sophists and their alleged ability to invert the strength of arguments, but from those we have now come to call the Presocratic philosophers.

The Presocratics were not just those who came before Socrates, for there are some Presocratic philosophers who were his contemporaries.  The term is sometimes used to suggest that, while Socrates cared about ethics, the Presocratic philosophers did not.  This is misleading, for we have evidence that a number of Presocratics explored ethical issues.  The term is best used to refer to the group of thinkers whom Socrates did not influence and whose fundamental uniting characteristic was that they sought to explain the world in terms of its own inherent principles.  The 6th cn. Milesian Thales, for instance, believed that the fundamental principle of all things was water.  Anaximander believed the principle was the indefinite (apeiron), and for Anaxamines it was air.  Later in Plato’s Apology (26d-e), Socrates rhetorically asks whether Meletus thinks he is prosecuting Anaxagoras, the 5th cn. thinker who argued that the universe was originally a mixture of elements that have since been set in motion by Nous, or Mind.  Socrates suggests that he does not engage in the same sort of cosmological inquiries that were the main focus of many Presocratics.

The other group against which Socrates compares himself is the Sophists, learned men who travelled from city to city offering to teach the youth for a fee.  While he claims he thinks it an admirable thing to teach as Gorgias, Prodicus, or Hippias claim they can (Apology 20a), he argues that he himself does not have knowledge of human excellence or virtue (Apology 20b-c).  Though Socrates inquires after the nature of virtue, he does not claim to know it, and certainly does not ask to be paid for his conversations.

b. Socratic Themes in Plato’s Apology

i. Socratic Ignorance

Plato’s Socrates moves next to explain the reason he has acquired the reputation he has and why so many citizens dislike him.  The oracle at Delphi told Socrates’ friend Chaerephon, “no one is wiser than Socrates” (Apology 21a).  Socrates explains that he was not aware of any wisdom he had, and so set out to find someone who had wisdom in order to demonstrate that the oracle was mistaken.  He first went to the politicians but found them lacking wisdom.  He next visited the poets and found that, though they spoke in beautiful verses, they did so through divine inspiration, not because they had wisdom of any kind.  Finally, Socrates found that the craftsmen had knowledge of their own craft, but that they subsequently believed themselves to know much more than they actually did.  Socrates concluded that he was better off than his fellow citizens because, while they thought they knew something and did not, he was aware of his own ignorance.  The god who speaks through the oracle, he says, is truly wise, whereas human wisdom is worth little or nothing (Apology 23a).

This awareness of one’s own absence of knowledge is what is known as Socratic ignorance, and it is arguably the thing for which Socrates is most famous.  Socratic ignorance is sometimes called simple ignorance, to be distinguished from the double ignorance of the citizens with whom Socrates spoke.  Simple ignorance is being aware of one’s own ignorance, whereas double ignorance is not being aware of one’s ignorance while thinking that one knows.  In showing many influential figures in Athens that they did not know what they thought they did, Socrates came to be despised in many circles.

It is worth nothing that Socrates does not claim here that he knows nothing.  He claims that he is aware of his ignorance and that whatever it is that he does know is worthless.  Socrates has a number of strong convictions about what makes for an ethical life, though he cannot articulate precisely why these convictions are true.  He believes for instance that it is never just to harm anyone, whether friend or enemy, but he does not, at least in Book I of the Republic, offer a systematic account of the nature of justice that could demonstrate why this is true.  Because of his insistence on repeated inquiry, Socrates has refined his convictions such that he can both hold particular views about justice while maintaining that he does not know the complete nature of justice.

We can see this contrast quite clearly in Socrates’ cross-examination of his accuser Meletus.  Because he is charged with corrupting the youth, Socrates inquires after who it is that helps the youth (Apology, 24d-25a).  In the same way that we take a horse to a horse trainer to improve it, Socrates wants to know the person to whom we take a young person to educate him and improve him.  Meletus’ silence condemns him: he has never bothered to reflect on such matters, and therefore is unaware of his ignorance about matters that are the foundation of his own accusation (Apology 25b-c).  Whether or not Socrates—or Plato for that matter—actually thinks it is possible to achieve expertise in virtue is a subject on which scholars disagree.

ii. Priority of the Care of the Soul

Throughout his defense speech (Apology 20a-b, 24c-25c, 31b, 32d, 36c, 39d) Socrates repeatedly stresses that a human being must care for his soul more than anything else (see also Crito 46c-47d, Euthyphro 13b-c, Gorgias 520a4ff).  Socrates found that his fellow citizens cared more for wealth, reputation, and their bodies while neglecting their souls (Apology 29d-30b).  He believed that his mission from the god was to examine his fellow citizens and persuade them that the most important good for a human being was the health of the soul. Wealth, he insisted, does not bring about human excellence or virtue, but virtue makes wealth and everything else good for human beings (Apology 30b).

Socrates believes that his mission of caring for souls extends to the entirety of the city of Athens.  He argues that the god gave him to the city as a gift and that his mission is to help improve the city.  He thus attempts to show that he is not guilty of impiety precisely because everything he does is in response to the oracle and at the service of the god.  Socrates characterizes himself as a gadfly and the city as a sluggish horse in need of stirring up (Apology 30e).  Without philosophical inquiry, the democracy becomes stagnant and complacent, in danger of harming itself and others.  Just as the gadfly is an irritant to the horse but rouses it to action, so Socrates supposes that his purpose is to agitate those around him so that they begin to examine themselves.  One might compare this claim with Socrates’ assertion in the Gorgias that, while his contemporaries aim at gratification, he practices the true political craft because he aims at what is best (521d-e).  Such comments, in addition to the historical evidence that we have, are Socrates’ strongest defense that he is not only not a burden to the democracy but a great asset to it.

iii. The Unexamined Life

After the jury has convicted Socrates and sentenced him to death, he makes one of the most famous proclamations in the history of philosophy.  He tells the jury that he could never keep silent, because “the unexamined life is not worth living for human beings” (Apology 38a).  We find here Socrates’ insistence that we are all called to reflect upon what we believe, account for what we know and do not known, and generally speaking to seek out, live in accordance with, and defend those views that make for a well lived and meaningful life.

Some scholars call attention to Socrates’ emphasis on human nature here, and argue that the call to live examined lives follows from our nature as human beings.  We are naturally directed by pleasure and pain.  We are drawn to power, wealth and reputation, the sorts of values to which Athenians were drawn as well.  Socrates’ call to live examined lives is not necessarily an insistence to reject all such motivations and inclinations but rather an injunction to appraise their true worth for the human soul.  The purpose of the examined life is to reflect upon our everyday motivations and values and to subsequently inquire into what real worth, if any, they have.  If they have no value or indeed are even harmful, it is upon us to pursue those things that are truly valuable.

One can see in reading the Apology that Socrates examines the lives of his jurors during his own trial.  By asserting the primacy of the examined life after he has been convicted and sentenced to death, Socrates, the prosecuted, becomes the prosecutor, surreptitiously accusing those who convicted him of not living a life that respects their own humanity.  He tells them that by killing him they will not escape examining their lives.  To escape giving an account of one’s life is neither possible nor good, Socrates claims, but it is best to prepare oneself to be as good as possible (Apology 39d-e).

We find here a conception of a well-lived life that differs from one that would likely be supported by many contemporary philosophers.  Today, most philosophers would argue that we must live ethical lives (though what this means is of course a matter of debate) but that it is not necessary for everyone to engage in the sort of discussions Socrates had everyday, nor must one do so in order to be considered a good person.  A good person, we might say, lives a good life insofar as he does what is just, but he does not necessarily need to be consistently engaged in debates about the nature of justice or the purpose of the state.  No doubt Socrates would disagree, not just because the law might be unjust or the state might do too much or too little, but because, insofar as we are human beings, self-examination is always beneficial to us.

c. Other Socratic Positions and Arguments

In addition to the themes one finds in the Apology, the following are a number of other positions in the Platonic corpus that are typically considered Socratic.

i. Unity of Virtue; All Virtue is Knowledge

In the Protagoras (329b-333b) Socrates argues for the view that all of the virtues—justice, wisdom, courage, piety, and so forth—are one.  He provides a number of arguments for this thesis.  For example, while it is typical to think that one can be wise without being temperate, Socrates rejects this possibility on the grounds that wisdom and temperance both have the same opposite: folly.  Were they truly distinct, they would each have their own opposites.  As it stands, the identity of their opposites indicates that one cannot possess wisdom without temperance and vice versa.

This thesis is sometimes paired with another Socratic, view, that is, that virtue is a form of knowledge (Meno 87e-89a; cf. Euthydemus 278d-282a).  Things like beauty, strength, and health benefit human beings, but can also harm them if they are not accompanied by knowledge or wisdom.  If virtue is to be beneficial it must be knowledge, since all the qualities of the soul are in themselves neither beneficial not harmful, but are only beneficial when accompanied by wisdom and harmful when accompanied by folly.

ii. No One Errs Knowingly/No One Errs Willingly

Socrates famously declares that no one errs or makes mistakes knowingly (Protagoras 352c, 358b-b).  Here we find an example of Socrates’ intellectualism.  When a person does what is wrong, their failure to do what is right is an intellectual error, or due to their own ignorance about what is right.  If the person knew what was right, he would have done it.  Hence, it is not possible for someone simultaneously know what is right and do what is wrong.  If someone does what is wrong, they do so because they do not know what is right, and if they claim the have known what was right at the time when they committed the wrong, they are mistaken, for had they truly known what was right, they would have done it.

Socrates therefore denies the possibility of akrasia, or weakness of the will.  No one errs willingly (Protagoras 345c4-e6).  While it might seem that Socrates is equivocating between knowingly and willingly, a look at Gorgias 466a-468e helps clarify his thesis.  Tyrants and orators, Socrates tells Polus, have the least power of any member of the city because they do not do what they want.  What they do is not good or beneficial even though human beings only want what is good or beneficial.  The tyrant’s will, corrupted by ignorance, is in such a state that what follows from it will necessarily harm him.  Conversely, the will that is purified by knowledge is in such a state that what follows from it will necessarily be beneficial.

iii. All Desire is for the Good

One of the premises of the argument just mentioned is that human beings only desire the good.  When a person does something for the sake of something else, it is always the thing for the sake of which he is acting that he wants.  All bad things or intermediate things are done not for themselves but for the sake of something else that is good.  When a tyrant puts someone to death, for instance, he does this because he thinks it is beneficial in some way.  Hence his action is directed towards the good because this is what he truly wants (Gorgias 467c-468b).

A similar version of this argument is in the Meno, 77b-78b.  Those that desire bad things do not know that they are truly bad; otherwise, they would not desire them.  They do not naturally desire what is bad but rather desire those things that they believe to be good but that are in fact bad.  They desire good things even though they lack knowledge of what is actually good.

iv. It is Better to Suffer an Injustice Than to Commit One

Socrates infuriates Polus with the argument that it is better to suffer an injustice than commit one (Gorgias 475a-d).  Polus agrees that it is more shameful to commit an injustice, but maintains it is not worse.  The worst thing, in his view, is to suffer injustice.  Socrates argues that, if something is more shameful, it surpasses in either badness or pain or both.  Since committing an injustice is not more painful than suffering one, committing an injustice cannot surpass in pain or both pain and badness.  Committing an injustice surpasses suffering an injustice in badness; differently stated, committing an injustice is worse than suffering one.  Therefore, given the choice between the two, we should choose to suffer rather than commit an injustice.

This argument must be understood in terms of the Socratic emphasis on the care of the soul.  Committing an injustice corrupts one’s soul, and therefore committing injustice is the worst thing a person can do to himself (cf. Crito 47d-48a, Republic I 353d-354a).  If one commits injustice, Socrates goes so far as to claim that it is better to seek punishment than avoid it on the grounds that the punishment will purge or purify the soul of its corruption (Gorgias 476d-478e).

v. Eudaimonism

The Greek word for happiness is eudaimonia, which signifies not merely feeling a certain way but being a certain way.  A different way of translating eudaimonia is well-being.  Many scholars believe that Socrates holds two related but not equivalent principles regarding eudaimonia: first, that it is rationally required that a person make his own happiness the foundational consideration for his actions, and second, that each person does in fact pursue happiness as the foundational consideration for his actions.  In relation to Socrates’ emphasis on virtue, it is not entirely clear what that means.  Virtue could be identical to happiness—in which case there is no difference between the two and if I am virtuous I am by definition happy—virtue could be a part of happiness—in which case if I am virtuous I will be happy although I could be made happier by the addition of other goods—or virtue could be instrumental for happiness—in which case if I am virtuous I might be happy (and I couldn’t be happy without virtue), but there is no guarantee that I will be happy.

There are a number of passages in the Apology that seem to indicate that the greatest good for a human being is having philosophical conversation (36b-d, 37e-38a, 40e-41c). Meno 87c-89a suggests that knowledge of the good guides the soul toward happiness (cf. Euthydemus 278e-282a).  And at Gorgias 507a-c Socrates suggests that the virtuous person, acting in accordance with wisdom, attains happiness (cf. Gorgias 478c-e: the happiest person has no badness in his soul).

vi. Ruling is An Expertise

Socrates is committed to the theme that ruling is a kind of craft or art (technē).  As such, it requires knowledge.  Just as a doctor brings about a desired result for his patient—health, for instance—so the ruler should bring about some desired result in his subject (Republic 341c-d, 342c).  Medicine, insofar as it has the best interest of its patient in mind, never seeks to benefit the practitioner.  Similarly, the ruler’s job is to act not for his own benefit but for the benefit of the citizens of the political community.  This is not to say that there might not be some contingent benefit that accrues to the practitioner; the doctor, for instance, might earn a fine salary.  But this benefit is not intrinsic to the expertise of medicine as such.  One could easily conceive of a doctor that makes very little money.  One cannot, however, conceive of a doctor that does not act on behalf of his patient.  Analogously, ruling is always for the sake of the ruled citizen, and justice, contra the famous claim from Thrasymachus, is not whatever is in the interest of the ruling power (Republic 338c-339a).

d. Socrates the Ironist

The suspicion that Socrates is an ironist can mean a number of things: on the one hand, it can indicate that Socrates is saying something with the intent to convey the opposite meaning.  Some readers for instance, including a number in the ancient world, understood Socrates’ avowal of ignorance in precisely this way.  Many have interpreted Socrates’ praise of Euthyphro, in which he claims that he can learn from him and will become his pupil, as an example of this sort of irony (Euthyphro 5a-b).  On the other hand, the Greek word eirōneia was understood to carry with it a sense of subterfuge, rendering the sense of the word something like masking with the intent to deceive.

Additionally, there are a number of related questions about Socrates’ irony.   Is the interlocutor supposed to be aware of the irony, or is he ignorant of it?  Is it the job of the reader to discern the irony?  Is the purpose of irony rhetorical, intended to maintain Socrates’ position as the director of the conversation, or pedagogical, meant to encourage the interlocutor to learn something?  Could it be both?

Scholars disagree on the sense in which we ought to call Socrates ironic.  When Socrates asks Callicles to tell him what he means by the stronger and to go easy on him so that he might learn better, Callicles claims he is being ironic (Gorgias 489e).  Thrasymachus accuses Socrates of being ironic insofar as he pretends he does not have an account of justice, when he is actually hiding what he truly thinks (Republic 337a).  And though the Symposium is generally not thought to be a “Socratic” dialogue, we there find Alcibiades accusing Socrates of being ironic insofar as he acts like he is interested in him but then deny his advances (Symposium 216e, 218d).  It is not clear which kind of irony is at work with these examples.

Aristotle defines irony as an attempt at self-deprecation (Nicomachean Ethics 4.7, 1127b23-26).  He argues that self-deprecation is the opposite of boastfulness, and people that engage in this sort of irony do so to avoid pompousness and make their characters more attractive.  Above all, such people disclaim things that bring reputation.  On this reading, Socrates was prone to understatement.

There are some thinkers for whom Socratic irony is not just restricted to what Socrates says.  The 19th century Danish philosopher Søren Kierkegaard held the view that Socrates himself, his character, is ironic.  The 20th century philosopher Leo Strauss defined irony as the noble dissimulation of one’s worth.  On this reading, Socrates’ irony consisted in his refusal to display his superiority in front of his inferiors so that his message would be understood only by the privileged few.  As such, Socratic irony is intended to conceal Socrates’ true message.

3. Method: How Did Socrates Do Philosophy?

As famous as the Socratic themes are, the Socratic method is equally famous.  Socrates conducted his philosophical activity by means of question an answer, and we typically associate with him a method called the elenchus.  At the same time, Plato’s Socrates calls himself a midwife—who has no ideas of his own but helps give birth to the ideas of others—and proceeds dialectically—defined either as asking questions, embracing the practice of collection and division, or proceeding from hypotheses to first principles.

a. The Elenchus: Socrates the Refuter

A typical Socratic elenchus is a cross-examination of a particular position, proposition, or definition, in which Socrates tests what his interlocutor says and refutes it.  There is, however, great debate amongst scholars regarding not only what is being refuted but also whether or not the elenchus can prove anything.  There are questions, in other words, about the topic of the elenchus and its purpose or goal.

i. Topic

Socrates typically begins his elenchus with the question, “what is it”?  What is piety, he asks Euthyphro.  Euthyphro appears to give five separate definitions of piety: piety is proceeding against whomever does injustice (5d-6e), piety is what is loved by the gods (6e-7a), piety is what is loved by all the gods (9e), the godly and the pious is the part of the just that is concerned with the care of the gods (12e), and piety is the knowledge of sacrificing and praying (13d-14a).  For some commentators, what Socrates is searching for here is a definition.  Other commentators argue that Socrates is searching for more than just the definition of piety but seeks a comprehensive account of the nature of piety.  Whatever the case, Socrates refutes the answer given to him in response to the ‘what is it’ question.

Another reading of the Socratic elenchus is that Socrates is not just concerned with the reply of the interlocutor but is concerned with the interlocutor himself.  According to this view, Socrates is as much concerned with the truth or falsity of propositions as he is with the refinement of the interlocutor’s way of life.  Socrates is concerned with both epistemological and moral advances for the interlocutor and himself.  It is not propositions or replies alone that are refuted, for Socrates does not conceive of them dwelling in isolation from those that hold them.  Thus conceived, the elenchus refutes the person holding a particular view, not just the view.  For instance, Socrates shames Thrasymachus when he shows him that he cannot maintain his view that justice is ignorance and injustice is wisdom (Republic I 350d).  The elenchus demonstrates that Thrasymachus cannot consistently maintain all his claims about the nature of justice.  This view is consistent with a view we find in Plato’s late dialogue called the Sophist, in which the Visitor from Elea, not Socrates, claims that the soul will not get any advantage from learning that it is offered to it until someone shames it by refuting it (230b-d).

ii. Purpose

In terms of goal, there are two common interpretations of the elenchus.  Both have been developed by scholars in response to what Gregory Vlastos called the problem of the Socratic elenchus.  The problem is how Socrates can claim that position W is false, when the only thing he has established is its inconsistency with other premises whose truth he has not tried to establish in the elenchus.

The first response is what is called the constructivist position.  A constructivist argues that the elenchus establishes the truth or falsity of individual answers.  The elenchus on this interpretation can and does have positive results.  Vlastos himself argued that Socrates not only established the inconsistency of the interlocutor’s beliefs by showing their inconsistency, but that Socrates’ own moral beliefs were always consistent, able to withstand the test of the elenchus.  Socrates could therefore pick out a faulty premise in his elenctic exchange with an interlocutor, and sought to replace the interlocutor’s false beliefs with his own.

The second response is called the non-constructivist position.  This position claims that Socrates does not think the elenchus can establish the truth or falsity of individual answers.  The non-constructivist argues that all the elenchus can show is the inconsistency of W with the premises X, Y, and Z.  It cannot establish that ~W is the case, or for that matter replace any of the premises with another, for this would require a separate argument.  The elenchus establishes the falsity of the conjunction of W, X, Y, and Z, but not the truth or falsity of any of those premises individually.  The purpose of the elenchus on this interpretation is to show the interlocutor that he is confused, and, according to some scholars, to use that confusion as a stepping stone on the way to establishing a more consistent, well-formed set of beliefs.

b. Maieutic: Socrates the Midwife

In Plato’s Theaetetus Socrates identifies himself as a midwife (150b-151b).  While the dialogue is not generally considered Socratic, it is elenctic insofar as it tests and refutes Theaetetus’ definitions of knowledge.  It also ends without a conclusive answer to its question, a characteristic it shares with a number of Socratic dialogues.

Socrates tells Theaetetus that his mother Phaenarete was a midwife (149a) and that he himself is an intellectual midwife.  Whereas the craft of midwifery (150b-151d) brings on labor pains or relieves them in order to help a woman deliver a child, Socrates does not watch over the body but over the soul, and helps his interlocutor give birth to an idea.  He then applies the elenchus to test whether or not the intellectual offspring is a phantom or a fertile truth.  Socrates stresses that both he and actual midwives are barren, and cannot give birth to their own offspring.  In spite of his own emptiness of ideas, Socrates claims to be skilled at bringing forth the ideas of others and examining them.

c. Dialectic: Socrates the Constructer

The method of dialectic is thought to be more Platonic than Socratic, though one can understand why many have associated it with Socrates himself.  For one thing, the Greek dialegesthai ordinarily means simply “to converse” or “to discuss.”  Hence when Socrates is distinguishing this sort of discussion from rhetorical exposition in the Gorgias, the contrast seems to indicate his preference for short questions and answers as opposed to longer speeches (447b-c, 448d-449c).

There are two other definitions of dialectic in the Platonic corpus.  First, in the Republic, Socrates distinguishes between dianoetic thinking, which makes use of the senses and assumes hypotheses, and dialectical thinking, which does not use the senses and goes beyond hypotheses to first principles (Republic VII 510c-511c, 531d-535a).  Second, in the Phaedrus, Sophist, Statesman, and Philebus, dialectic is defined as a method of collection and division.  One collects things that are scattered into one kind and also divides each kind according to its species (Phaedrus 265d-266c).

Some scholars view the elenchus and dialectic as fundamentally different methods with different goals, while others view them as consistent and reconcilable.  Some even view them as two parts of one argument procedure, in which the elenchus refutes and dialectic constructs.

4. Legacy: How Have Other Philosophers Understood Socrates?

Nearly every school of philosophy in antiquity had something positive to say about Socrates, and most of them drew their inspiration from him.  Socrates also appears in the works of many famous modern philosophers.  Immanuel Kant, the 18th century German philosopher best known for the categorical imperative, hailed Socrates, amongst other ancient philosophers, as someone who didn’t just speculate but who lived philosophically.  One of the more famous quotes about Socrates is from John Stuart Mill, the 19th century utilitarian philosopher who claimed that it is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied.  The following is but a brief survey of Socrates as he is treated in philosophical thinking that emerges after the death of Aristotle in 322 B.C.E.

a. Hellenistic Philosophy

i. The Cynics

The Cynics greatly admired Socrates, and traced their philosophical lineage back to him.  One of the first representatives of the Socratic legacy was the Cynic Diogenes of Sinope.  No genuine writings of Diogenes have survived and most of our evidence about him is anecdotal.  Nevertheless, scholars attribute a number of doctrines to him.  He sought to undermine convention as a foundation for ethical values and replace it with nature.  He understood the essence of human being to be rational, and defined happiness as freedom and self-mastery, an objective readily accessible to those who trained the body and mind.

ii. The Stoics

There is a biographical story according to which Zeno, the founder of the Stoic school and not the Zeno of Zeno's Paradoxes, became interested in philosophy by reading and inquiring about Socrates.  The Stoics took themselves to be authentically Socratic, especially in defending the unqualified restriction of ethical goodness to ethical excellence, the conception of ethical excellence as a kind of knowledge, a life not requiring any bodily or external advantage nor ruined by any bodily disadvantage, and the necessity and sufficiency of ethical excellence for complete happiness.

Zeno is known for his characterization of the human good as a smooth flow of life.  Stoics were therefore attracted to the Socratic elenchus because it could expose inconsistencies—both social and psychological—that disrupted one’s life.  In the absence of justification for a specific action or belief, one would not be in harmony with oneself, and therefore would not live well.  On the other hand, if one held a position that survived cross-examination, such a position would be consistent and coherent.  The Socratic elenchus was thus not just an important social and psychological test, but also an epistemological one.  The Stoics held that knowledge was a coherent set of psychological attitudes, and therefore a person holding attitudes that could withstand the elenchus could be said to have knowledge.  Those with inconsistent or incoherent psychological commitments were thought to be ignorant.

Socrates also figures in Roman Stoicism, particularly in the works of Seneca and Epictetus.  Both men admired Socrates’ strength of character.  Seneca praises Socrates for his ability to remain consistent unto himself in the face of the threat posed by the Thirty Tyrants, and also highlights the Socratic focus on caring for oneself instead of fleeing oneself and seeking fulfillment by external means.  Epictetus, when offering advice about holding to one’s own moral laws as inviolable maxims, claims, “though you are not yet a Socrates, you ought, however, to live as one desirous of becoming a Socrates” (Enchiridion 50).

One aspect of Socrates to which Epictetus was particularly attracted was the elenchus.  Though his understanding of the process is in some ways different from Socrates’, throughout his Discourses Epictetus repeatedly stresses the importance of recognition of one’s ignorance (2.17.1) and awareness of one’s own impotence regarding essentials (2.11.1).  He characterizes Socrates as divinely appointed to hold the elenctic position (3.21.19) and associates this role with Socrates’ protreptic expertise (2.26.4-7).  Epictetus encouraged his followers to practice the elenchus on themselves, and claims that Socrates did precisely this on account of his concern with self-examination (2.1.32-3).

iii. The Skeptics

Broadly speaking, skepticism is the view that we ought to be either suspicious of claims to epistemological truth or at least withhold judgment from affirming absolute claims to knowledge.  Amongst Pyrrhonian skeptics, Socrates appears at times like a dogmatist and at other times like a skeptic or inquirer.  On the one hand, Sextus Empiricus lists Socrates as a thinker who accepts the existence of god (Against the Physicists, I.9.64) and then recounts the cosmological argument that Xenophon attributes to Socrates (Against the Physicists, I.9.92-4).  On the other hand, in arguing that human being is impossible to conceive, Sextus Empiricus cites Socrates as unsure whether or not he is a human being or something else (Outlines of Pyrrhonism 2.22).  Socrates is also said to have remained in doubt about this question (Against the Professors 7.264).

Academic skeptics grounded their position that nothing can be known in Socrates’ admission of ignorance in the Apology (Cicero, On the Orator 3.67, Academics 1.44).  Arcesilaus, the first head of the Academy to take it toward a skeptical turn, picked up from Socrates the procedure of arguing, first asking others to give their positions and then refuting them (Cicero, On Ends 2.2, On the Orator 3.67, On the Nature of the Gods 1.11).  While the Academy would eventually move away from skepticism, Cicero, speaking on behalf of the Academy of Philo, makes the claim that Socrates should be understood as endorsing the claim that nothing, other than one’s own ignorance, could be known (Academics 2.74).

iv. The Epicurean

The Epicureans were one of the few schools that criticized Socrates, though many scholars think that this was in part because of their animus toward their Stoic counterparts, who admired him.  In general, Socrates is depicted in Epicurean writings as a sophist, rhetorician, and skeptic who ignored natural science for the sake of ethical inquiries that concluded without answers.  Colotes criticizes Socrates’ statement in the Phaedrus (230a) that he does not know himself (Plutarch, Against Colotes 21 1119b), and Philodemus attacks Socrates’ argument in the Protagoras (319d) that virtue cannot be taught (Rhetoric I 261, 8ff).

The Epicureans wrote a number of books against several of Plato’s Socratic dialogues, including the Lysis, Euthydemus, and Gorgias.  In the Gorgias we find Socrates suspicious of the view that pleasure is intrinsically worthy and his insistence that pleasure is not the equivalent of the good (Gorgias 495b-499b).  In defining pleasure as freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) and defining this sort of pleasure as the sole good for human beings, the Epicureans shared little with the unbridled hedonism Socrates criticizes Callicles for embracing.  Indeed, in the Letter to Menoeceus, Epicurus explicitly argues against pursuing this sort of pleasure (131-132).  Nonetheless, the Epicureans did equate pleasure with the good, and the view that pleasure is not the equivalent of the good could not have endeared Socrates to their sentiment.

Another reason for the Epicurean refusal to praise Socrates or make him a cornerstone of their tradition was his perceived irony.  According to Cicero, Epicurus was opposed to Socrates’ representing himself as ignorant while simultaneously praising others like Protagoras, Hippias, Prodicus, and Gorgias (Rhetoric, Vol. II, Brutus 292).  This irony for the Epicureans was pedagogically pointless: if Socrates had something to say, he should have said it instead of hiding it.

v. The Peripatetics

Aristotle’s followers, the Peripatetics, either said little about Socrates or were pointedly vicious in their attacks.  Amongst other things, the Peripatetics accused Socrates of being a bigamist, a charge that appears to have gained so much traction that the Stoic Panaetius wrote a refutation of it (Plutarch, Aristides 335c-d).  The general peripatetic criticism of Socrates, similar in one way to the Epicureans, was that he concentrated solely on ethics, and that this was an unacceptable ideal for the philosophical life.

b. Modern Philosophy

i. Hegel

In Socrates, Hegel found what he called the great historic turning point (Philosophy of History, 448).  With Socrates, Hegel claims, two opposed rights came into collision: the individual consciousness and the universal law of the state.  Prior to Socrates, morality for the ancients was present but it was not present Socratically.  That is, the good was present as a universal, without its having had the form of the conviction of the individual in his consciousness (407).  Morality was present as an immediate absolute, directing the lives of citizens without their having reflected upon it and deliberated about it for themselves.  The law of the state, Hegel claims, had authority as the law of the gods, and thus had a universal validity that was recognized by all (408).

In Hegel’s view the coming of Socrates signals a shift in the relationship between the individual and morality.  The immediate now had to justify itself to the individual consciousness.  Hegel thus not only ascribes to Socrates the habit of asking questions about what one should do but also about the actions that the state has prescribed.  With Socrates, consciousness is turned back within itself and demands that the law should establish itself before consciousness, internal to it, not merely outside it (408-410).   Hegel attributes to Socrates a reflective questioning that is skeptical, which moves the individual away from unreflective obedience and into reflective inquiry about the ethical standards of one’s community.

Generally, Hegel finds in Socrates a skepticism that renders ordinary or immediate knowledge confused and insecure, in need of reflective certainty which only consciousness can bring (370).  Though he attributes to the sophists the same general skeptical comportment, in Socrates Hegel locates human subjectivity at a higher level.  With Socrates and onward we have the world raising itself to the level of conscious thought and becoming object for thought.  The question as to what Nature is gives way to the question about what Truth is, and the question about the relationship of self-conscious thought to real essence becomes the predominant philosophical issue (450-1).

ii. Kierkegaard

Kierkegaard’s most well recognized views on Socrates are from his dissertation, The Concept of Irony With Continual Reference to Socrates.  There, he argues that Socrates is not the ethical figure that the history of philosophy has thought him to be, but rather an ironist in all that he does.  Socrates does not just speak ironically but is ironic.  Indeed, while most people have found Aristophanes’ portrayal of Socrates an obvious exaggeration and caricature, Kierkegaard goes so far as to claim that he came very close to the truth in his depiction of Socrates.  He rejects Hegel’s picture of Socrates ushering in a new era of philosophical reflection and instead argues that the limits of Socratic irony testified to the need for religious faith.  As opposed to the Hegelian view that Socratic irony was an instrument in the service of the development of self-consciousness, Kierkegaard claims that irony was Socrates’ position or comportment, and that he did not have any more than this to give.

Later in his writing career Kierkegaard comes to think that he has neglected Socrates’ significance as an ethical and religious figure.  In his final essay entitled My Task, Kierkegaard claims that his mission is a Socratic one; that is, in his task to reinvigorate a Christianity that remained the cultural norm but had, in Kierkegaard’s eyes, nearly ceased altogether to be practiced authentically, Kierkegaard conceives of himself as a kind of Christian Socrates, rousing Christians from their complacency to a conception of Christian faith as the highest, most passionate expression of individual subjectivity.  Kierkegaard therefore sees himself as a sort of Christian gadfly.  The Socratic call to become aware of one’s own ignorance finds its parallel in the Kierkegaardian call to recognize one’s own failing to truly live as a Christian.  The Socratic claim to ignorance—while Socrates is closer to knowledge than his contemporaries—is replaced by the Kierkegaard’s claim that he is not a Christian—though certainly more so than his own contemporaries.

iii. Nietzsche

Nietzsche’s most famous account of Socrates is his scathing portrayal in The Birth of Tragedy, in which Socrates and rational thinking lead to the emergence of an age of decadence in Athens.  The delicate balance in Greek culture between the Apollonian—order, calmness, self-control, restraint—and the Dionysian—chaos, revelry, self-forgetfulness, indulgence— initially represented on stage in the tragedies of Aeschylus and Sophocles, gave way to the rationalism of Euripides.  Euripides, Nietzsche argues, was only a mask for the newborn demon called Socrates (section 12).  Tragedy—and Greek culture more generally—was corrupted by “aesthetic Socratism”, whose supreme law, Nietzsche argues, was that ‘to be beautiful everything must be intelligible’.  Whereas the former sort of tragedy absorbed the spectator in the activities and sufferings of its chief characters, the emergence of Socrates heralded the onset of a new kind of tragedy in which this identification is obstructed by the spectators having to figure out the meaning and presuppositions of the characters’ suffering.

Nietzsche continues his attack on Socrates later in his career in Twilight of the Idols.  Socrates here represents the lowest class of people (section 3), and his irony consists in his being an exaggeration at the same time as he conceals himself (4).  He is the inventor of dialectic (5) which he wields mercilessly because, being an ugly plebeian, he had no other means of expressing himself (6) and therefore employed question and answer to render his opponent powerless (7).  Socrates turned dialectic into a new kind of contest (8), and because his instincts had turned against each other and were in anarchy (9), he established the rule of reason as a counter-tyrant in order not to perish (10).  Socrates’ decadence here consists in his having to fight his instincts (11).  He was thus profoundly anti-life, so much so that he wanted to die (12).

Nonetheless, while Nietzsche accuses Socrates of decadence, he nevertheless recognizes him as a powerful individual, which perhaps accounts for why we at times find in Nietzsche a hesitant admiration of Socrates.  He calls Socrates one of the very greatest instinctive forces (The Birth of Tragedy, section 13), labels him as a “free spirit” (Human, All Too Human I, 433) praises him as the first “philosopher of life” in his 17th lecture on the Preplatonics, and anoints him a ‘virtuoso of life’ in his notebooks from 1875.  Additionally, contra Twilight of the Idols, in Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Nietzsche speaks of a death in which one’s virtue still shines, and some commentators have seen in this a celebration of the way in which Socrates died.

iv. Heidegger

Heidegger finds in Socrates a kinship with his own view that the truth of philosophy lies in a certain way of seeing things, and thus is identical with a particular kind of method.  He attributes to Socrates the view that the truth of some subject matter shows itself not in some definition that is the object or end of a process of inquiry, but in the very process of inquiry itself.  Heidegger characterizes the Socratic method as a kind of productive negation: by refuting that which stands in front of it—in Socrates’ case, an interlocutor’s definition—it discloses the positive in the very process of questioning.  Socrates is not interested in articulating propositions about piety but rather concerned with persisting in a questioning relation to it that preserves its irreducible sameness.  Behind multiple examples of pious action is Piety, and yet Piety is not something that can be spoken of.  It is that which discloses itself through the process of silent interrogation.

It is precisely in his emphasis on silence that Heidegger diverges from Socrates.  Where Socrates insisted on the give and take of question and answer, Heideggerian questioning is not necessarily an inquiry into the views of others but rather an openness to the truth that one maintains without the need to speak.  To remain in dialogue with a given phenomenon is not the same thing as conversing about it, and true dialogue is always silent.

v. Gadamer

As Heidegger’s student, Gadamer shares his fundamental view that truth and method cannot be divorced in philosophy.  At the same time, his hermeneutics leads him to argue for the importance of dialectic as conversation.  Gadamer claims that whereas philosophical dialectic presents the whole truth by superceding all its partial propositions, hermeneutics too has the task of revealing a totality of meaning in all its relations.  The distinguishing characteristic of Gadamer’s hermeneutical dialectic is that it recognizes radical finitude: we are always already in an open-ended dialogical situation.  Conversation with the interlocutor is thus not a distraction that leads us away from seeing the truth but rather is the site of truth.  It is for this reason that Gadamer claims Plato communicated his philosophy only in dialogues: it was more than just an homage to Socrates, but was a reflection of his view that the word find its confirmation in another and in the agreement of another.

Gadamer also sees in the Socratic method an ethical way of being.  That is, he does not just think that Socrates converses about ethics but that repeated Socratic conversation is itself indicative of an ethical comportment.  On this account, Socrates knows the good not because he can give some final definition of it but rather because of his readiness to give an account of it.  The problem of not living an examined life is not that we might live without knowing what is ethical, but because without asking questions as Socrates does, we will not be ethical.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ahbel-Rappe, Sara, and Rachana Kamtekar (eds.), A Companion to Socrates (Oxford: Blackwell, 2006).
  • Arrowsmith, William, Lattimore, Richmond, and Parker, Douglass (trans.), Four Plays by Aristophanes: The Clouds, The Birds, Lysistrata, The Frogs (New York: Meridian, 1994).
  • Barnes, Jonathan, Complete Works of Aristotle vols. 1 & 2  (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Benson, Hugh H. (ed.), Essays on the Philosophy of Socrates (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • Brickhouse, Thomas C. & Smith, Nicholas D., Plato’s Socrates (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994).
  • Burkert, Walter, Greek Religion (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1985).
  • Cooper, John M., Plato: Collected Works (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1997).
  • Guthrie, W.K.C., Socrates (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1971).
  • Kahn, Charles H., Plato and the Socratic Dialogue (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Kraut, Richard (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Plato (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992).
  • Morrison, Donald R., The Cambridge Companion to Socrates (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012).
  • Rudebusch, George, Socrates (Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009).
  • Santas, Gerasimos, Socrates: Philosophy in Plato’s Early Dialogues (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979).
  • Taylor, C.C.W, 1998, Socrates (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socrates, Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).
  • Xenophon: Memorabilia. Oeconomicus. Symposium. Apologia. (Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1923).

 

Author Information

James M. Ambury
Email: jamesambury@kings.edu
King’s College
U. S. A.

John Locke (1632—1704)

LockeJohn Locke was among the most famous philosophers and political theorists of the 17th century.  He is often regarded as the founder of a school of thought known as British Empiricism, and he made foundational contributions to modern theories of limited, liberal government. He was also influential in the areas of theology, religious toleration, and educational theory. In his most important work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke set out to offer an analysis of the human mind and its acquisition of knowledge. He offered an empiricist theory according to which we acquire ideas through our experience of the world. The mind is then able to examine, compare, and combine these ideas in numerous different ways. Knowledge consists of a special kind of relationship between different ideas. Locke’s emphasis on the philosophical examination of the human mind as a preliminary to the philosophical investigation of the world and its contents represented a new approach to philosophy, one which quickly gained a number of converts, especially in Great Britain. In addition to this broader project, the Essay contains a series of more focused discussions on important, and widely divergent, philosophical themes. In politics, Locke is best known as a proponent of limited government. He uses a theory of natural rights to argue that governments have obligations to their citizens, have only limited powers over their citizens, and can ultimately be overthrown by citizens under certain circumstances. He also provided powerful arguments in favor of religious toleration. This article attempts to give a broad overview of all key areas of Locke’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. The Main Project of the Essay
    1. Ideas
    2. The Critique of Nativism
    3. Idea Acquisition
    4. Language
    5. The Account of Knowledge
  3. Special Topics in the Essay
    1. Primary and Secondary Qualities
    2. Mechanism
    3. Volition and Agency
    4. Personhood and Personal Identity
    5. Real and Nominal Essences
    6. Religious Epistemology
  4. Political Philosophy
    1. The Two Treatises
    2. Property
    3. Toleration
  5. Theology
  6. Education
  7. Locke’s Influence
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Locke’s Works
    2. Recommended Reading

1. Life and Works

John Locke was born in 1632 in Wrington, a small village in southwestern England. His father, also named John, was a legal clerk and served with the Parliamentary forces in the English Civil War. His family was well-to-do, but not of particularly high social or economic standing. Locke spent his childhood in the West Country and as a teenager was sent to Westminster School in London.

Locke was successful at Westminster and earned a place at Christ Church, Oxford. He was to remain in Oxford from 1652 until 1667. Although he had little appreciation for the traditional scholastic philosophy he learned there, Locke was successful as a student and after completing his undergraduate degree he held a series of administrative and academic posts in the college. Some of Locke’s duties included instruction of undergraduates. One of his earliest substantive works, the Essays on the Law of Nature, was developed in the course of his teaching duties. Much of Locke’s intellectual effort and energy during his time at Oxford, especially during his later years there, was devoted to the study of medicine and natural philosophy (what we would now call science). Locke read widely in these fields, participated in various experiments, and became acquainted with Robert Boyle and many other notable natural philosophers. He also undertook the normal course of education and training to become a physician.

Locke left Oxford for London in 1667 where he became attached to the family of Anthony Ashley Cooper (then Lord Ashley, later the Earl of Shaftesbury). Locke may have played a number of roles in the household, mostly likely serving as tutor to Ashley’s son. In London, Locke continued to pursue his interests in medicine and natural philosophy. He formed a close working relationship with Thomas Sydenham, who later became one the most famous physicians of the age. He made a number of contacts within the newly formed Royal Society and became a member in 1668. He also acted as the personal physician to Lord Ashley. Indeed, on one occasion Locke participated in a very delicate surgical operation which Ashley credited with saving his life. Ashley was one of the most prominent English politicians at the time. Through his patronage Locke was able to hold a series of governmental posts. Most of his work related to policies in England’s American and Caribbean colonies. Most importantly, this was the period in Locke’s life when he began the project which would culminate in his most famous work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. The two earliest drafts of that work date from 1671. He was to continue work on this project intermittentlyfor nearly twenty years.

Locke travelled in France for several years starting in 1675. When he returned to England it was only to be for a few years. The political scene had changed greatly while Locke was away. Shaftesbury (as Ashley was now known) was out of favor and Locke’s association with him had become a liability. It was around this time that Locke composed his most famous political work, the Two Treatises Concerning Government. Although the Two Treatises would not be published until 1689 they show that he had already solidified his views on the nature and proper form of government. Following Shaftesbury’s death Locke fled to the Netherlands to escape political persecution. While there Locke travelled a great deal (sometimes for his own safety) and worked on two projects. First, he continued work on the Essay. Second, he wrote a work entitled Epistola de Tolerantia, which was published anonymously in 1689. Locke’s experiences in England, France, and the Netherlands convinced him that governments should be much more tolerant of religious diversity than was common at the time.

Following the Glorious Revolution of 1688-1689 Locke was able to return to England. He published both the Essay and the Two Treatises (the second anonymously) shortly after his return. He initially stayed in London but soon moved to the home of Francis and Damaris Masham in the small village of Oates, Essex. Damaris Masham, who was the daughter of a notable philosopher named Ralph Cudworth, had become acquainted with Locke several years before. The two formed a very close friendship which lasted until Locke’s death. During this period Locke kept busy working on politics, toleration, philosophy, economics, and educational theory.

Locke engaged in a number of controversies during his life, including a notable one with Jonas Proast over toleration. But Locke’s most famous and philosophically important controversy was with Edward Stillingfleet, the Bishop of Worcester. Stillingfleet, in addition to being a powerful political and theological figure, was an astute and forceful critic. The two men debated a number of the positions in the Essay in a series of published letters.

In his later years Locke devoted much of his attention to theology. His major work in this field was The Reasonableness of Christianity, published (again anonymously) in 1695. This work was controversial because Locke argued that many beliefs traditionally believed to be mandatory for Christians were unnecessary. Locke argued for a highly ecumenical form of Christianity. Closer to the time of his death Locke wrote a work on the Pauline Epistles. The work was unfinished, but published posthumously. A short work on miracles also dates from this time and was published posthumously.

Locke suffered from health problems for most of his adult life. In particular, he had respiratory ailments which were exacerbated by his visits to London where the air quality was very poor. His health took a turn for the worse in 1704 and he became increasingly debilitated. He died on 28 October 1704 while Damaris Masham was reading him the Psalms. He was buried at High Laver, near Oates. He wrote his own epitaph which was both humble and forthright.

2. The Main Project of the Essay

According to Locke’s own account the motivation for writing the Essay came to him while debating an unrelated topic with friends. He reports that they were able to make little headway on this topic and that they very quickly met with a number of confusions and difficulties. Locke realized that to make progress on this topic it was first necessary to examine something more fundamental: the human understanding. It was “necessary to examine our own Abilities, and see, what Objects our Understandings were, or were not fitted to deal with.” (Epistle, 7).

Locke’s insight was that before we can analyze the world and our access to it we have to know something about ourselves. We need to know how we acquire knowledge. We also need to know which areas of inquiry we are well suited to and which are epistemically closed to us, that is, which areas are such that we could not know them even in principle. We further need to know what knowledge consists in.  In keeping with these questions, at the very outset of the Essay Locke writes that it is his “Purpose enquire into the Original, Certainty, and Extent of humane Knowledge; together, with the Grounds and Degrees of Belief, Opinion, and Assent.” (1.1.2, 42). Locke thinks that it is only once we understand our cognitive capabilities that we can suitably direct our researches into the world. This may have been what Locke had in mind when he claimed that part of his ambition in the Essay was to be an “Under-Laborer” who cleared the ground and laid the foundations for the work of famous scientists like Robert Boyle and Isaac Newton.

The Essay is divided into four books with each book contributing to Locke’s overall goal of examining the human mind with respect to its contents and operations. In Book I Locke rules out one possible origin of our knowledge. He argues that our knowledge cannot have been innate. This sets up Book II in which Locke argues that all of our ideas come from experience. In this book he seeks to give an account of how even ideas like God, infinity, and space could have been acquired through our perceptual access to the world and our mental operations. Book III is something of a digression as Locke turns his attention to language and the role it plays in our theorizing. Locke’s main goal here is cautionary, he thinks language is often an obstacle to understanding and he offers some recommendations to avoid confusion. Finally, Book IV discusses knowledge, belief, and opinion. Locke argues that knowledge consists of special kinds of relations between ideas and that we should regulate our beliefs accordingly.

a. Ideas

The first chapter of the Essay contains an apology for the frequent use of the word “idea” in the book. According to Locke, ideas are the fundamental units of mental content and so play an integral role in his explanation of the human mind and his account of our knowledge. Locke was not the first philosopher to give ideas a central role; Descartes, for example, had relied heavily on them in explaining the human mind. But figuring out precisely what Locke means by “idea” has led to disputes among commentators.

One place to begin is with Locke’s own definition. He claims that by “idea” he means “whatsoever is the Object of the Understanding when a Man thinks…whatever is meant by Phantasm, Notion, Species, or whatever it is, which the Mind can be employ’d about in thinking.” (1.1.8, 47). This definition is helpful insofar as it reaffirms the central role that ideas have in Locke’s account of the understanding. Ideas are the sole entities upon which our minds work. Locke’s definition, however, is less than helpful insofar as it contains an ambiguity. On one reading, ideas are mental objects. The thought is that when an agent perceives an external world object like an apple there is some thing in her mind which represents that apple. So when an agent considers an apple what she is really doing is thinking about the idea of that apple. On a different reading, ideas are mental actions. The thought here is that when an agent perceives an apple she is really perceiving the apple in a direct, unmediated way. The idea is the mental act of making perceptual contact with the external world object. In recent years, most commentators have adopted the first of these two readings. But this debate will be important in the discussion of knowledge below.

b. The Critique of Nativism

The first of the Essay’s four books is devoted to a critique of nativism, the doctrine that some ideas are innate in the human mind, rather than received in experience. It is unclear precisely who Locke’s targets in this book are, though Locke does cite Herbert of Cherbury and other likely candidates include René Descartes, the Cambridge Platonists, and a number of lesser known Anglican theologians. Finding specific targets, however, might not be that important given that much of what Locke seeks to do in Book I is motivate and make plausible the alternative account of idea acquisition that he offers in Book II.

The nativist view which Locke attacks in Book I holds that human beings have mental content which is innate in the mind. This means that there are certain ideas (units of mental content) which were neither acquired via experience nor constructed by the mind out of ideas received in experience. The most popular version of this position holds that there are certain ideas which God planted in all minds at the moment of their creation.

Locke attacks both the view that we have any innate principles (for example, the whole is greater than the part, do unto others as you would have done unto you, etc.) as well as the view that there are any innate singular ideas (for example, God, identity, substance,  and so forth). The main thrust of Locke’s argument lies in pointing out that none of the mental content alleged to be innate is universally shared by all humans. He notes that children and the mentally disabled, for example, do not have in their minds an allegedly innate complex thought like “equals taken from equals leave equals”. He also uses evidence from travel literature to point out that many non-Europeans deny what were taken to be innate moral maxims and that some groups even lack the idea of a God. Locke takes the fact that not all humans have these ideas as evidence that they were not implanted by God in humans minds, and that they are therefore acquired rather than innate.

There is one misunderstanding which it is important to avoid when considering Locke’s anti-nativism. The misunderstanding is, in part, suggested by Locke’s claim that the mind is like a tabula rasa (a blank slate) prior to sense experience. This makes it sound as though the mind is nothing prior to the advent of ideas. In fact, Locke’s position is much more nuanced. He makes it clear that the mind has any number of inherent capacities, predispositions, and inclinations prior to receiving any ideas from sensation. His anti-nativist point is just that none of these is triggered or exercised until the mind receives ideas from sensation. 

c. Idea Acquisition

In Book II Locke offers his alternative theory of how the human mind comes to be furnished with the ideas it has. Every day we think of complex things like orange juice, castles, justice, numbers, and motion. Locke’s claim is that the ultimate origin of all of these ideas lies in experience: “Experience: In that, all our Knowledge is founded; and from that it ultimately derives itself. Our Observation employ’d either about external, sensible Objects; or about the internal Operations of our Minds, perceived and reflected on by ourselves, is that, which supplies our Understandings with all the material of thinking. These two are the Fountains of Knowledge, from whence all the Ideas we have, or can naturally have, do spring.” (2.1.2, 104).

In the above passage Locke allows for two distinct types of experience. Outer experience, or sensation, provides us with ideas from the traditional five senses. Sight gives us ideas of colors, hearing gives us ideas of sounds, and so on. Thus, my idea of a particular shade of green is a product of seeing a fern. And my idea of a particular tone is the product of my being in the vicinity of a piano while it was being played. Inner experience, or reflection, is slightly more complicated. Locke thinks that the human mind is incredibly active; it is constantly performing what he calls operations. For example, I often remember past birthday parties, imagine that I was on vacation, desire a slice of pizza, or doubt that England will win the World Cup. Locke believes that we are able to notice or experience our mind performing these actions and when we do we receive ideas of reflection. These are ideas such as memory, imagination, desire, doubt, judgment, and choice.

Locke’s view is that experience (sensation and reflection) issues us with simple ideas. These are the minimal units of mental content; each simple idea is “in itself uncompounded, [and] contains in it nothing but one uniform Appearance, or Conception in the mind, and is not distinguishable into different Ideas.” (2.2.1, 119). But many of my ideas are not simple ideas. My idea of a glass of orange juice or my idea of the New York subway system, for example, could not be classed a simple ideas. Locke calls ideas like these complex ideas. His view is that complex ideas are the product of combining our simple ideas together in various ways. For example, my complex idea of a glass of orange juice consists of various simple ideas (the color orange, the feeling of coolness, a certain sweet taste, a certain acidic taste, and so forth) combined together into one object. Thus, Locke believes our ideas are compositional. Simple ideas combine to form complex ideas. And these complex ideas can be combined to form even more complex ideas.

We are now in a position to understand the character of Locke’s empiricism. He is committed to the view that all of our ideas, everything we can possibly think of, can be broken down into simple ideas received in experience. The bulk of Book II is devoted to making this empiricism plausible. Locke does this both by undertaking an examination of the various abilities that the human mind has (memory, abstraction, volition, and so forth) and by offering an account of how even abstruse ideas like space, infinity, God, and causation could be constructed using only the simple ideas received in experience.

Our complex ideas are classified into three different groups: substances, modes, and relations. Ideas of substances are ideas of things which are thought to exist independently. Ordinary objects like desks, sheep, and mountains fall into this group. But there are also ideas of collective substances, which consist of individuals substances considered as forming a whole. A group of individual buildings might be considered a town. And a group of individual men and women might be considered together as an army. In addition to describing the way we think about individual substances, Locke also has an interesting discussion of substance-in-general. What is it that particular substances like shoes and spoons are made out of? We could suggest that they are made out of leather and metal. But the question could be repeated, what are leather and metal made of? We might respond that they are made of matter. But even here, Locke thinks we can ask what matter is made of. What gives rise to the properties of matter? Locke claims that we don’t have a very clear idea here. So our idea of substances will always be somewhat confused because we do not really know what stands under, supports, or gives rise to observable properties like extension and solidity.

Ideas of modes are ideas of things which are dependent on substances in some way. In general, this taxonomic category can be somewhat tricky. It does not seem to have a clear parallel in contemporary metaphysics, and it is sometimes thought to be a mere catch-all category for things which are neither substances nor relations. But it is helpful to think of modes as being like features of substances; modes are “such complex Ideas, which however compounded, contain not in them the supposition of subsisting by themselves, but are considered as Dependences on, or Affections of Substances.” (2.12.4, 165). Modes come in two types: simple and mixed. Simple modes are constructed by combining a large number of a single type of simple ideas together. For example, Locke believes there is a simple idea of unity. Our complex idea of the number seven, for example, is a simple mode and is constructed by concatenating seven simple ideas of unity together. Locke uses this category to explain how we think about a number of topics relating to number, space, time, pleasure and pain, and cognition. Mixed modes, on the other hand, involve combining together simple ideas of more than one kind. A great many ideas fall into this category. But the most important ones are moral ideas. Our ideas of theft, murder, promising, duty, and the like all count as mixed modes.

Ideas of relations are ideas that involve more than one substance. My idea of a husband, for example, is more than the idea of an individual man. It also must include the idea of another substance, namely the idea of that man’s spouse. Locke is keen to point out that much more of our thought involves relations than we might previously have thought. For example, when I think about Elizabeth II as the Queen of England my thinking actually involves relations, because I cannot truly think of Elizabeth as a queen without conceiving of her as having a certain relationship of sovereignty to some subjects (individual substances like David Beckham and J.K. Rowling). Locke then goes on to explore the role that relations have in our thinking about causation, space, time, morality, and (very famously) identity.

Throughout his discussion of the different kinds of complex ideas Locke is keen to emphasize that all of our ideas can ultimately be broken down into simple ideas received in sensation and reflection. Put differently, Locke is keenly aware that the success of his empiricist theory of mind depends on its ability to account for all the contents of our minds. Whether or not Locke is successful is a matter of dispute. On some occasions the analysis he gives of how a very complex idea could be constructed using only simple ideas is vague and requires the reader to fill in some gaps. And commentators have also suggested that some of the simple ideas Locke invokes, for example the simple ideas of power and unity, do not seem to be obvious components of our phenomenological experience.

Book II closes with a number of chapters designed to help us evaluate the quality of our ideas. Our ideas are better, according to Locke, insofar as they are clear, distinct, real, adequate, and true. Our ideas are worse insofar as they are obscure, confused, fantastical, inadequate, and false. Clarity and obscurity are explained via an analogy to vision. Clear ideas, like clear images, are crisp and fresh, not faded or diminished in the way that obscure ideas (or images) are. Distinction and confusion have to do with the individuation of ideas. Ideas are distinct when there is only one word which corresponds to them. Confused ideas are ones to which more than one word can correctly apply or ones that lack a clear and consistent correlation to one particular word. To use one of Locke’s examples, an idea of a leopard as a beast with spots would be confused. It is not distinct because the word “lynx” could apply to that idea just as easily as the word “leopard.” Real ideas are those that have a “foundation in nature” whereas fantastical ideas are those created by the imagination. For example, our idea of a horse would be a real idea and our idea of a unicorn would be fantastical. Adequacy and inadequacy have to do with how well ideas match the patterns according to which they were made. Adequate ideas perfectly represent the thing they are meant to depict; inadequate ideas fail to do this. Ideas are true when the mind understands them in a way that is correct according to linguistic practices and the way the world is structured. They are false when the mind misunderstands them along these lines.

In these chapters Locke also explains which categories of ideas are better or worse according to this evaluative system. Simple ideas do very well. Because objects directly produce them in the mind they tend to be clear, distinct, and so forth. Ideas of modes and relations also tend to do very well, but for a different reason. Locke thinks that the archetypes of these ideas are in the mind rather than in the world. As such, it is easy for these ideas to be good because the mind has a clear sense of what the ideas should be like as it constructs them. By contrast, ideas of substances tend to fare very poorly. The archetypes for these ideas are external world objects. Because our perceptual access to these objects is limited in a number of ways and because these objects are so intricate, ideas of substances tend to be confused, inadequate, false, and so forth.

d. Language

Book III of the Essay is concerned with language. Locke admits that this topic is something of a digression. He did not originally plan for language to take up an entire book of the Essay. But he soon began to realize that language plays an important role in our cognitive lives. Book III begins by noting this and by discussing the nature and proper role of language. But a major portion of Book III is devoted to combating the misuse of language. Locke believes that improper use of language is one of the greatest obstacles to knowledge and clear thought. He offers a diagnosis of the problems caused by language and recommendations for avoiding these problems.

Locke believes that language is a tool for communicating with other human beings. Specifically, Locke thinks that we want to communicate about our ideas, the contents of our minds. From here it is a short step to the view that: “Words in their primary or immediate Signification, stand for nothing, but the Ideas in the Mind of him that uses them.” (3.2.2, 405). When an agent utters the word “gold” she is referring to her idea of a shiny, yellowish, malleable substance of great value. When she utters the word “carrot” she is referring to her idea of a long, skinny, orange vegetable which grows underground. Locke is, of course, aware that the names we choose for these ideas are arbitrary and merely a matter of social convention.

Although the primary use of words is to refer to ideas in the mind of the speaker, Locke also allows that words make what he calls “secret reference” to two other things. First, humans also want their words to refer to the corresponding ideas in the minds of other humans. When Smith says “carrot” within earshot of Jones her hope is that Jones also has an idea of the long, skinny vegetable and that saying “carrot” will bring that idea into Jones’ mind. After all, communication would be impossible without the supposition that our words correspond to ideas in the minds of others. Second, humans suppose that their words stand for objects in the world. When Smith says “carrot” she wants to refer to more than just her idea, she also wants to refer to the long skinny objects themselves. But Locke is suspicious of these two other ways of understanding signification. He thinks the latter one, in particular, is illegitimate.

After discussing these basic features of language and reference Locke goes on to discuss specific cases of the relationship between ideas and words: words used for simple ideas, words used for modes, words used for substances, the way in which a single word can refer to a multiplicity of ideas, and so forth. There is also an interesting chapter on “particles.” These are words which do not refer to an idea but instead refer to a certain connection which holds between ideas. For example, if I say “Secretariat is brown” the word “Secretariat” refers to my idea of a certain racehorse, and “brown” refers to my idea of a certain color, but the word “is” does something different. That word is a particle and indicates that I am expressing something about the relationship between my ideas of Secretariat and brown and suggesting that they are connected in a certain way. Other particles includes words like “and”, “but”, “hence”, and so forth.

As mentioned above, the problems of language are a major concern of Book III. Locke thinks that language can lead to confusion and misunderstanding for a number of reasons. The signification of words is arbitrary, rather than natural, and this means it can be difficult to understand which words refer to which ideas. Many of our words stand for ideas which are complex, hard to acquire, or both. So many people will struggle to use those words appropriately. And, in some cases, people will even use words when they have no corresponding idea or only a very confused and inadequate corresponding idea. Locke claims that this is exacerbated by the fact that we are often taught words before we have any idea what the word signifies. A child, for example, might be taught the word “government” at a young age, but it will take her years to form a clear idea of what governments are and how they operate. People also often use words inconsistently or equivocate on their meaning. Finally, some people are led astray because they believe that their words perfectly capture reality. Recall from above that people secretly and incorrectly use their words to refer to objects in the external world. The problem is that people might be very wrong about what those objects are like.

Locke thinks that a result of all this is that people are seriously misusing language and that many debates and discussions in important fields like science, politics, and philosophy are confused or consist of merely verbal disputes. Locke provides a number of examples of language causing problems: Cartesians using “body” and “extension” interchangeably, even though the two ideas are distinct; physiologists who agree on all the facts yet have a long dispute because they have different understandings of the word “liquor”; Scholastic philosophers using the term “prime matter” when they are unable to actually frame an idea of such a thing, and so forth.

The remedies that Locke recommends for fixing these problems created by language are somewhat predictable. But Locke is quick to point out that while they sound like easy fixes they are actually quite difficult to implement. The first and most important step is to only use words when we have clear ideas attached to them. (Again, this sounds easy, but many of us might actually struggle to come up with a clear idea corresponding to even everyday terms like “glory” or “fascist”.) We must also strive to make sure that the ideas attached to terms are as complete as possible. We must strive to ensure that we use words consistently and do not equivocate; every time we utter a word we should use it to signify one and the same idea. Finally, we should communicate our definitions of words to others.

e. The Account of Knowledge

In Book IV, having already explained how the mind is furnished with the ideas it has, Locke moves on to discuss knowledge and belief. A good place to start is with a quote from the beginning of Book IV: “Knowledge then seems to me to be nothing but the perception of the connexion and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy of any of our Ideas. Where this Perception is, there is Knowledge, and where it is not, there, though we may fancy, guess, or believe, yet we always come short of Knowledge.” (4.2.2, 525). Locke spends the first part of Book IV clarifying and exploring this conception of knowledge. The second part focuses on how we should apportion belief in cases where we lack knowledge.

What does Locke mean by the “connection and agreement” and the “disagreement and repugnancy” of our ideas? Some examples might help. Bring to mind your idea of white and your idea of black. Locke thinks that upon doing this you will immediately perceive that they are different, they “disagree”. It is when you perceive this disagreement that you know the fact that white is not black. Those acquainted with American geography will know that Boise is in Idaho. On Locke’s account of knowledge, this means that they are able to perceive a certain connection that obtains between their idea of Idaho and their idea of Boise. Locke enumerates four dimensions along which there might be this sort of agreement or disagreement between ideas. First, we can perceive when two ideas are identical or non-identical. For example, knowing that sweetness is not bitterness consists in perceiving that the idea of sweetness is not identical to the idea of bitterness. Second, we can perceive relations that obtain between ideas. For example, knowing that 7 is greater than 3 consists in perceiving that there is a size relation of bigger and smaller between the two ideas. Third, we can perceive when our idea of a certain feature accompanies our idea of a certain thing. If I know that ice is cold this is because I perceive that my idea of cold always accompanies my idea of ice. Fourthly, we can perceive when existence agrees with any idea. I can have knowledge of this fourth kind when, for example, I perform the cogito and recognize the special relation between my idea of myself and my idea of existence. Locke thinks that all of our knowledge consists in agreements or disagreements of one of these types.

After detailing the types of relations between ideas which constitute knowledge Locke continues on to discuss three “degrees” of knowledge in 4.2. These degrees seem to consist in different ways of knowing something. The first degree Locke calls intuitive knowledge. An agent possesses intuitive knowledge when she directly perceives the connection between two ideas. This is the best kind of knowledge, as Locke says “Such kind of Truths, the Mind perceives at the first sight of the Ideas together, by bare Intuition, without the intervention of any other Idea; and this kind of knowledge is the clearest, and most certain, that humane Frailty is capable of.” (4.2.1, 531). The second degree of knowledge is called demonstrative. Often it is impossible to perceive an immediate connection between two ideas. For example, most of us are unable to tell that the three interior angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles simply by looking at them. But most of us, with the assistance of a mathematics teacher, can be made to see that they are equal by means of a geometric proof or demonstration. This is the model for demonstrative knowledge. Even if one is unable to directly perceive a relation between idea-X and idea-Y one might perceive a relation indirectly by means of idea-A and idea-B. This will be possible if the agent has intuitive knowledge of a connection between X and A, between A and B, and then between B and Y. Demonstrative knowledge consists, therefore, in a string of relations each of which is known intuitively.

The third degree of knowledge is called sensitive knowledge and has been the source of considerable debate and confusion among Locke commentators. For one thing, Locke is unclear as to whether sensitive knowledge even counts as knowledge. He writes that intuitive and demonstrative knowledge are, properly speaking, the only forms of knowledge, but that “There is, indeed, another Perception of the Mind…which going beyond bare probability, and yet not reaching perfectly to either of the foregoing degrees of certainty, passes under the name of Knowledge.” (4.2.14, 537). Sensitive knowledge has to do with the relationship between our ideas and the objects in the external world that produce them. Locke claims that we can be certain that when we perceive something, an orange, for example, there is an object in the external world which is responsible for these sensations. Part of Locke’s claim is that there is a serious qualitative difference between biting into an orange and remembering biting into an orange. There is something in the phenomenological experience of the former which assures us of a corresponding object in the external world.

Locke spends a fair amount of time in Book IV responding to worries that he is a skeptic or that his account of knowledge, with its emphasis on ideas, fails to be responsive to the external world. The general worry for Locke is fairly simple. By claiming that ideas are the only things humans have epistemic access to, and by claiming that knowledge relates only to our ideas, Locke seems to rule out the claim that we can ever know about the external world. Lockean agents are trapped behind a “veil of ideas.” Thus we cannot have any assurance that our ideas provide us with reliable information about the external world. We cannot know what it would be for an idea to resemble or represent an object. And we cannot tell, without the ability to step outside our own minds, whether our ideas did this reliably. This criticism has historically been thought to endanger Locke’s entire project. Gilbert Ryle’s memorable assessment is that “nearly every youthful student of philosophy both can and does in his second essay refute Locke’s entire Theory of Knowledge.” Recent scholarship has been much more charitable to Locke. But the central problem is still a pressing one.

Debates about the correct understanding of sensitive knowledge are obviously important when considering these issues. At first blush, the relation involved in sensitive knowledge seems to be a relation between an idea and a physical object in the world. But, if this reading is correct, then it becomes difficult to understand the many passages in which Locke insists that knowledge is a relation that holds only between ideas. Also relevant are debates about how to correctly understand Lockean ideas. Recall from above that although many understand ideas as mental objects, some understand them as mental acts. While most of the text seems to favor the first interpretation, it seems that the second interpretation has a significant advantage when responding to these skeptical worries. The reason is that the connection between ideas and external world objects is built right into the definition of an idea. An idea just is a perception of an external world object.

However the debates discussed in the previous paragraph are resolved, there is a consensus among commentators that Locke believes the scope of human understanding is very narrow. Humans are not capable of very much knowledge. Locke discusses this is 4.3, a chapter entitled “Extent of Humane Knowledge.” The fact that our knowledge is so limited should come as no surprise. We have already discussed the ways in which our ideas of substances are problematic. And we have just seen that we have no real understanding of the connection between our ideas and the objects that produce them.

The good news, however, is that while our knowledge might not be very extensive, it is sufficient for our needs. Locke’s memorable nautical metaphor holds that: “’Tis of great use to the Sailor to know the length of his Line, though he cannot with it fathom all the depths of the Ocean. ‘Tis well he knows, that it is long enough to reach the bottom, at such Places, as are necessary to direct his Voyage, and caution him against running upon Shoales, that may ruin him. Our Business here is not to know all things, but those which concern our Conduct.” (1.1.6, 46). Locke thinks we have enough knowledge to live comfortable lives on Earth, to realize that there is a God, to understand morality and behave appropriately, and to gain salvation. Our knowledge of morality, in particular, is very good. Locke even suggests that we might develop a demonstrable system of morality similar to Euclid’s demonstrable system of geometry. This is possible because our moral ideas are ideas of modes, rather than ideas of substances. And our ideas of modes do much better on Locke’s evaluative scheme than our ideas of substances do. Finally, while the limits to our knowledge might be disappointing, Locke notes that recognizing these limits is important and useful insofar as it will help us to better organize our intellectual inquiry. We will be saved from investigating questions which we could never know the answers to and can focus our efforts on areas where progress is possible.

One benefit of Locke’s somewhat bleak assessment of the scope of our knowledge was that it caused him to focus on an area which was underappreciated by many of his contemporaries. This was the arena of judgment or opinion, belief states which fall short of knowledge. Given that we have so little knowledge (that we can be certain of so little) the realm of probability becomes very important. Recall that knowledge consists in a perceived agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Belief that falls short of knowledge (judgment or opinion) consists in a presumed agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Consider an example: I am not entirely sure who the Prime Minister of Canada is, but I am somewhat confident it is Stephen Harper. Locke’s claim is that in judging that the Canadian PM is Stephen Harper I am acting as though a relation holds between the two ideas. I do not directly perceive a connection between my idea of Stephen Harper and my idea of the Canadian PM, but I presume that one exists.

After offering this account of what judgment is, Locke offers an analysis of how and why we form the opinions we do and offers some recommendations for forming our opinions responsibly. This includes a diagnosis of the errors people make in judging, a discussion of the different degrees of assent, and an interesting discussion of the epistemic value of testimony.

3. Special Topics in the Essay

As discussed above, the main project of the Essay is an examination of the human understanding and an analysis of knowledge. But the Essay is a rather expansive work and contains discussion of many other topics of philosophical interest. Some of these will be discussed below. A word of warning, however, is required before proceeding. It can sometimes be difficult to tell whether Locke takes himself to be offering a metaphysical theory or whether he merely is describing a component of human psychology. For example, we might question whether his account of personal identity is meant to give necessary and sufficient conditions for a metaphysical account of personhood or whether it is merely designed to tell us what sorts of identity attributions we do and should make and why. We may further question whether, when discussing primary and secondary qualities, Locke is offering a theory about how perception really works or whether this discussion is a mere digression used to illustrate a point about the nature of our ideas. So while many of these topics have received a great deal of attention, their precise relationship to the main project of the Essay can be difficult to locate.

a. Primary and Secondary Qualities

Book 2, Chapter 8 of the Essay contains an extended discussion of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Locke was hardly original in making this distinction. By the time the Essay was published, it had been made by many others and was even somewhat commonplace. That said, Locke’s formulation of the distinction and his analysis of the related issues has been tremendously influential and has provided the framework for much of the subsequent discussion on the topic.

Locke defines a quality as a power that a body has to produce ideas in us. So a simple object like a baked potato which can produce ideas of brownness, heat, ovular shape, solidity, and determinate size must have a series of corresponding qualities. There must be something in the potato which gives us the idea of brown, something in the potato which gives us the idea of ovular shape, and so on. The primary/secondary quality distinction claims that some of these qualities are very different from others.

Locke motivates the distinction between two types of qualities by discussing how a body could produce an idea in us. The theory of perception endorsed by Locke is highly mechanical. All perception occurs as a result of motion and collision. If I smell the baked potato, there must be small material particles which are flying off of the potato and bumping into nerves in my nose, the motion in the nose-nerves causes a chain reaction along my nervous system until eventually there is some motion in my brain and I experience the idea of a certain smell. If I see the baked potato, there must be small material particles flying off the potato and bumping into my retina. That bumping causes a similar chain reaction which ends in my experience of a certain roundish shape.

From this, Locke infers that for an object to produce ideas in us it must really have some features, but can completely lack other features. This mechanical theory of perception requires that objects producing ideas in us have shape, extension, mobility, and solidity. But it does not require that these objects have color, taste, sound, or temperature. So the primary qualities are qualities actually possessed by bodies. These are features that a body cannot be without. The secondary qualities, by contrast, are not really had by bodies. They are just ways of talking about the ideas that can be produced in us by bodies in virtue of their primary qualities. So when we claim that the baked potato is solid, this means that solidity is one of its fundamental features. But when I claim that it smells a certain earthy kind of way, this just means that its fundamental features are capable of producing the idea of the earthy smell in my mind.

These claims lead to Locke’s claims about resemblance: “From whence I think it is easie to draw this Observation, That the Ideas of primary Qualities of Bodies, are Resemblances of them, and their Patterns do really exist in the Bodies themselves; but the Ideas, produced in us by these Secondary Qualities, have no resemblance of them at all.” (2.8.14, 137). Insofar as my idea of the potato is of something solid, extended, mobile, and possessing a certain shape my idea accurately captures something about the real nature of the potato. But insofar as my idea of the potato is of something with a particular smell, temperature, and taste my ideas do not accurately capture mind-independent facts about the potato.

b. Mechanism

Around the time of the Essay the mechanical philosophy was emerging as the predominant theory about the physical world. The mechanical philosophy held that the fundamental entities in the physical world were small individual bodies called corpuscles. Each corpuscle was solid, extended, and had a certain shape. These corpuscles could combine together to form ordinary objects like rocks, tables, and plants. The mechanical philosophy argued that all features of bodies and all natural phenomena could be explained by appeal to these corpuscles and their basic properties (in particular, size, shape, and motion).

Locke was exposed to the mechanical philosophy while at Oxford and became acquainted with the writings of its most prominent advocates. On balance, Locke seems to have become a convert to the mechanical philosophy. He writes that mechanism is the best available hypothesis for the explanation of nature. We have already seen some of the explanatory work done by mechanism in the Essay. The distinction between primary and secondary qualities was a hallmark of the mechanical philosophy and neatly dovetailed with mechanist accounts of perception. Locke reaffirms his commitment to this account of perception at a number of other points in the Essay. And when discussing material objects Locke is very often happy to allow that they are composed of material corpuscles. What is peculiar, however, is that while the Essay does seem to have a number of passages in which Locke supports mechanical explanations and speaks highly of mechanism, it also contains some highly critical remarks about mechanism and discussions of the limits of the mechanical philosophy.

Locke’s critiques of mechanism can be divided into two strands. First, he recognized that there were a number of observed phenomena which mechanism struggled to explain. Mechanism did offer neat explanations of some observed phenomena. For example, the fact that objects could be seen but not smelled through glass could be explained by positing that the corpuscles which interacted with our retinas were smaller than the ones which interacted with our nostrils. So the sight corpuscles could pass through the spaces between the glass corpuscles, but the smell corpuscles would be turned away. But other phenomena were harder to explain. Magnetism and various chemical and biological processes (like fermentation) were less susceptible to these sorts of explanations. And universal gravitation, which Locke took Newton to have proved the existence of in the Principia, was particularly hard to explain. Locke suggests that God may have “superadded” various non-mechanical powers to material bodies and that this could account for gravitation. (Indeed, at several points he even suggests that God may have superadded the power of thought to matter and that humans might be purely material beings.)

Locke’s second set of critiques pertain to theoretical problems in the mechanical philosophy. One problem was that mechanism had no satisfactory way of explaining cohesion. Why do corpuscles sometimes stick together? If things like tables and chairs are just collections of small corpuscles then they should be very easy to break apart, the same way I can easily separate one group of marbles from another. Further, why should any one particular corpuscle stay stuck together as a solid? What accounts for its cohesion? Again, mechanism seems hard-pressed to offer an answer. Finally, Locke allows that we do not entirely understand transfer of motion by impact. When one corpuscle collides with another we actually do not have a very satisfying explanation for why the second moves away under the force of the impact.

Locke presses these critiques with some skill and in a serious manner. Still, ultimately he is guardedly optimistic about mechanism. This somewhat mixed attitude on Locke’s part has led commentators to debate questions about his exact attitude toward the mechanical philosophy and his motivations for discussing it.

c. Volition and Agency

In Book 2, Chapter 21 of the Essay Locke explores the topic of the will. One of the things which separates people from rocks and billiard balls is our ability to make decisions and control our actions. We feel that we are free in certain respects and that we have the power to choose certain thoughts and actions. Locke calls this power the will. But there are tricky questions about what this power consists in and about what it takes to freely (or voluntarily) choose something. 2.21 contains a delicate and sustained discussion of these tricky questions.

Locke first begins with questions of freedom and then proceeds to a discussion of the will. On Locke’s analysis, we are free to do those things which we both will to do and are physically capable of doing. For example, if I wish to jump into a lake and have no physical maladies which prevent it, then I am free to jump into the lake. By contrast, if I do not wish to jump into the lake, but a friend pushes me in, I did not act freely when I entered the water. Or, if I wish to jump into the lake, but have a spinal injury and cannot move my body, then I do not act freely when I stay on the shore. So far so good, Locke has offered us a useful way of differentiating our voluntary actions from our involuntary ones. But there is still a pressing question about freedom and the will: that of whether the will is itself free. When I am deciding whether or not to jump into the water, is the will determined by outside factors to choose one or the other? Or can it, so to speak, make up its own mind and choose either option?

Locke’s initial position in the chapter is that the will is determined. But in later sections he offers a qualification of sorts. In normal circumstances, the will is determined by what Locke calls uneasiness: “What is it that determines the Will in regard to our Actions? … some (and for the most part the most pressing) uneasiness a Man is at present under. That is that which successively determines the Will, and sets us upon those Actions, we perform.” (2.21.31, 250-1). The uneasiness is caused by the absence of something that is perceived as good. The perception of the thing as good gives rise to a desire for that thing. Suppose I choose to eat a slice of pizza. Locke would say I must have made this choice because the absence of the pizza was troubling me somehow (I was feeling hunger pains, or longing for something savory) and this discomfort gave rise to a desire for food. That desire in turn determined my will to choose to eat pizza.

Locke’s qualification to this account of the will being determined by uneasiness has to do with what he calls suspension. Beginning with the second edition of the Essay, Locke began to argue that the most pressing desire for the most part determines the will, but not always: “For the mind having in most cases, as is evident in Experience, a power to suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires, and so all, one after another, is at liberty to consider the objects of them; examine them on all sides, and weigh them with others.” (2.21.47, 263). So even if, at this moment, my desire for pizza is the strongest desire, Locke thinks I can pause before I decide to eat the pizza and consider the decision. I can consider other items in my desire set: my desire to lose weight, or to leave the pizza for my friend, or to keep a vegan diet. Careful consideration of these other possibilities might have the effect of changing my desire set. If I really focus on how important it is to stay fit and healthy by eating nutritious foods then my desire to leave the pizza might become stronger than my desire to eat it and my will may be determined to choose to not eat the pizza. But of course we can always ask whether a person has a choice whether or not to suspend judgment or whether the suspension of judgment is itself determined by the mind’s strongest desire. On this point Locke is somewhat vague. While most interpreters think our desires determine when judgment is suspended, some others disagree and argue that suspension of judgment offers Lockean agents a robust form of free will.

d. Personhood and Personal Identity

Locke was one of the first philosophers to give serious attention to the question of personal identity. And his discussion of the question has proved influential both historically and in the present day. The discussion occurs in the midst of Locke’ larger discussion of the identity conditions for various entities in Book II, Chapter 27. At heart, the question is simple, what makes me the same person as the person who did certain things in the past and that will do certain things in the future? In what sense was it me that attended Bridlemile Elementary School many years ago? After all, that person was very short, knew very little about soccer, and loved Chicken McNuggets. I, on the other hand, am average height, know tons of soccer trivia, and get rather queasy at the thought of eating chicken, especially in nugget form. Nevertheless, it is true that I am identical to the boy who attended Bridlemile.

In Locke’s time, the topic of personal identity was important for religious reasons. Christian doctrine held that there was an afterlife in which virtuous people would be rewarded in heaven and sinful people would be punished in hell. This scheme provided motivation for individuals to behave morally. But, for this to work, it was important that the person who is rewarded or punished is the same person as the one who lived virtuously or lived sinfully. And this had to be true even though the person being rewarded or punished had died, had somehow continued to exist in an afterlife, and had somehow managed to be reunited with a body. So it was important to get the issue of personal identity right.

Locke’s views on personal identity involve a negative project and a positive project. The negative project involves arguing against the view that personal identity consists in or requires the continued existence of a particular substance. And the positive project involves defending the view that personal identity consists in continuity of consciousness. We can begin with this positive view. Locke defines a person as “a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places; which it does only by that consciousness, which is inseparable from thinking, and as it seems to me essential to it.” (2.27.9, 335).  Locke suggests here that part of what makes a person the same through time is their ability to recognize past experiences as belonging to them. For me, part of what differentiates one little boy who attended Bridlemile Elementary from all the other children who went there is my realization that I share in his consciousness. Put differently, my access to his lived experience at Bridlemile is very different from my access to the lived experiences of others there: it is first-personal and immediate. I recognize his experiences there as part of a string of experiences that make up my life and join up to my current self and current experiences in a unified way. That is what makes him the same person as me.

Locke believes that this account of personal identity as continuity of consciousness obviates the need for an account of personal identity given in terms of substances. A traditional view held that there was a metaphysical entity, the soul, which guaranteed personal identity through time; wherever there was the same soul, the same person would be there as well. Locke offers a number of thought experiments to cast doubt on this belief and show that his account is superior. For example, if a soul was wiped clean of all its previous experiences and given new ones (as might be the case if reincarnation were true), the same soul would not justify the claim that all of those who had had it were the same person. Or, we could imagine two souls who had their conscious experiences completely swapped. In this case, we would want to say that the person went with the conscious experiences and did not remain with the soul.

Locke’s account of personal identity seems to be a deliberate attempt to move away from some of the metaphysical alternatives and to offer an account which would be acceptable to individuals from a number of different theological backgrounds. Of course, a number of serious challenges have been raised for Locke’s account.. Most of these focus on the crucial role seemingly played by memory. And the precise details of Locke’s positive proposal in 2.27 have been hard to pin down. Nevertheless, many contemporary philosophers believe that there is an important kernel of truth in Locke’s analysis.

e. Real and Nominal Essences

Locke’s distinction between the real essence of a substance and the nominal essence of a substance is one of the most fascinating components of the Essay. Scholastic philosophers had held that the main goal of metaphysics and science was to learn about the essences of things: the key metaphysical components of things which explained all of their interesting features. Locke thought this project was misguided. That sort of knowledge, knowledge of the real essences of beings, was unavailable to human beings. This led Locke to suggest an alternative way to understand and investigate nature; he recommends focusing on the nominal essences of things.

When Locke introduces the term real essence he uses it to refer to the “real constitution of any Thing, which is the foundation of all those Properties, that are combined in, and are constantly found to co-exist with [an object]” (3.6.6, 442). For the Scholastics this real essence would be an object’s substantial form. For proponents of the mechanical philosophy it would be the number and arrangement of the material corpuscles which composed the body. Locke sometimes endorses this latter understanding of real essence. But he insists that these real essences are entirely unknown and undiscoverable by us. The nominal essences, by contrast, are known and are the best way we have to understand individual substances. Nominal essences are just collections of all the observed features an individual thing has. So the nominal essence of a piece of gold would include the ideas of yellowness, a certain weight, malleability, dissolvability in certain chemicals, and so on.

Locke offers us a helpful analogy to illustrate the difference between real and nominal essences. He suggests that our position with respect to ordinary objects is like the position of someone looking at a very complicated clock. The gears, wheels, weights, and pendulum that produce the motions of the hands on the clock face (the clock’s real essence) are unknown to the person. They are hidden behind the casing. He or she can only know about the observable features like the clock’s shape, the movement of the hands, and the chiming of the hours (the clock’s nominal essence). Similarly, when I look at an object like a dandelion, I am only able to observe its nominal essence (the yellow color, the bitter smell, and so forth). I have no clear idea what produces these features of the dandelion or how they are produced.

Locke’s views on real and nominal essences have important consequences for his views about the division of objects into groups and sorts. Why do we consider some things to be zebras and other things to be rabbits? Locke’s view is that we group according to nominal essence, not according to (unknown) real essence. But this has the consequence that our groupings might fail to adequately reflect whatever real distinctions there might be in nature. So Locke is not a realist about species or types. Instead, he is a conventionalist. We project these divisions on the world when we choose to classify objects as falling under the various nominal essences we’ve created.

f. Religious Epistemology

The epistemology of religion (claims about our understanding of God and our duties with respect to him) were tremendously contentious during Locke’s lifetime. The English Civil War, fought during Locke’s youth, was in large part a disagreement over the right way to understand the Christian religion and the requirements of religious faith. Throughout the seventeenth century, a number of fundamentalist Christian sects continually threatened the stability of English political life. And the status of Catholic and Jewish people in England was a vexed one.

So the stakes were very high when, in 4.18, Locke discussed the nature of faith and reason and their respective domains. He defines reason as an attempt to discover certainty or probability through the use of our natural faculties in the investigation of the world. Faith, by contrast, is certainty or probability attained through a communication believed to have come, originally, from God. So when Smith eats a potato chip and comes to believe it is salty, she believes this according to reason. But when Smith believes that Joshua made the sun stand still in the sky because she read it in the Bible (which she takes to be divine revelation), she believes according to faith.

Although it initially sounds as though Locke has carved out quite separate roles for faith and reason, it must be noted that these definitions make faith subordinate to reason in a subtle way. For, as Locke explains: “Whatever GOD hath revealed, is certainly true; no Doubt can be made of it. This is the proper Object of Faith: But whether it be a divine Revelation, or no, Reason must judge; which can never permit the Mind to reject a greater Evidence to embrace what is less evident, nor allow it to entertain Probability in opposition to Knowledge and Certainty.” (4.18.10, 695). First, Locke thinks that if any proposition, even one which purports to be divinely revealed, clashes with the clear evidence of reason then it should not be believed. So, even if it seems like God is telling us that 1+1=3, Locke claims we should go on believing that 1+1=2 and we should deny that the 1+1=3 revelation was genuine. Second, Locke thinks that to determine whether or not something is divinely revealed we have to exercise our reason. How can we tell whether the Bible contains God’s direct revelation conveyed through the inspired Biblical authors or whether it is instead the work of mere humans? Only reason can help us settle that question. Locke thinks that those who ignore the importance of reason in determining what is and is not a matter of faith are guilty of “enthusiasm.” And in a chapter added to later editions of the Essay Locke sternly warns his readers against the serious dangers posed by this intellectual vice.

In all of this Locke emerges as a strong moderate. He himself was deeply religious and took religious faith to be important. But he also felt that there were serious limits to what could be justified through appeals to faith. The issues discussed in this section will be very important below where Locke’s views on the importance of religious toleration are discussed.

4. Political Philosophy

Locke lived during a very eventful time in English politics. The Civil War, Interregnum, Restoration, Exclusion Crisis, and Glorious Revolution all happened during his lifetime. For much of his life Locke held administrative positions in government and paid very careful attention to contemporary debates in political theory. So it is perhaps unsurprising that he wrote a number of works on political issues. In this field, Locke is best known for his arguments in favor of religious toleration and limited government. Today these ideas are commonplace and widely accepted. But in Locke’s time they were highly innovative, even radical.

a. The Two Treatises

Locke’s Two Treatises of Government were published in 1689. It was originally thought that they were intended to defend the Glorious Revolution and William’s seizure of the throne. We now know, however, that they were in fact composed much earlier. Nonetheless, they do lay out a view of government amenable to many of William’s supporters.

The First Treatise is now of primarily historical interest. It takes the form of a detailed critique of a work called Patriacha by Robert Filmer. Filmer had argued, in a rather unsophisticated way, in favor of divine right monarchy. On his view, the power of kings ultimately originated in the dominion which God gave to Adam and which had passed down in an unbroken chain through the ages. Locke disputes this picture on a number of historical grounds. Perhaps more importantly, Locke also distinguishes between a number of different types of dominion or governing power which Filmer had run together.

After clearing some ground in the First Treatise, Locke offers a positive view of the nature of government in the much better known Second Treatise. Part of Locke’s strategy in this work was to offer a different account of the origins of government. While Filmer had suggested that humans had always been subject to political power, Locke argues for the opposite. According to him, humans were initially in a state of nature. The state of nature was apolitical in the sense that there were no governments and each individual retained all of his or her natural rights. People possessed these natural rights (including the right to attempt to preserve one’s life, to seize unclaimed valuables, and so forth) because they were given by God to all of his people.

The state of nature was inherently unstable. Individuals would be under contrast threat of physical harm. And they would be unable to pursue any goals that required stability and widespread cooperation with other humans. Locke’s claim is that government arose in this context. Individuals, seeing the benefits which could be gained, decided to relinquish some of their rights to a central authority while retaining other rights. This took the form of a contract. In agreement for relinquishing certain rights, individuals would receive protection from physical harm, security for their possessions, and the ability to interact and cooperate with other humans in a stable environment.

So, according to this view, governments were instituted by the citizens of those governments. This has a number of very important consequences. On this view, rulers have an obligation to be responsive to the needs and desires of these citizens. Further, in establishing a government the citizens had relinquished some, but not all of their original rights. So no ruler could claim absolute power over all elements of a citizen’s life. This carved out important room for certain individual rights or liberties. Finally, and perhaps most importantly, a government which failed to adequately protect the rights and interests of its citizens or a government which attempted to overstep its authority would be failing to perform the task for which it was created. As such, the citizens would be entitled to revolt and replace the existing government with one which would suitably carry out the duties of ensuring peace and civil order while respecting individual rights.

So Locke was able to use the account of natural rights and a government created through contract to accomplish a number of important tasks. He could use it to show why individuals retain certain rights even when they are subject to a government. He could use it to show why despotic governments which attempted to unduly infringe on the rights of their citizens were bad. And he could use it to show that citizens had a right to revolt in instances where governments failed in certain ways. These are powerful ideas which remain important even today.

For more. see the article Political Philosophy.

b. Property

Locke’s Second Treatise on government contains an influential account of the nature of private property. According to Locke, God gave humans the world and its contents to have in common. The world was to provide humans with what was necessary for the continuation and enjoyment of life. But Locke also believed it was possible for individuals to appropriate individual parts of the world and justly hold them for their own exclusive use. Put differently, Locke believed that we have a right to acquire private property.

Locke’s claim is that we acquire property by mixing our labor with some natural resource. For example, if I discover some grapes growing on a vine, through my labor in picking and collecting these grapes I acquire an ownership right over them. If I find an empty field and then use my labor to plow the field then plant and raise crops, I will be the proper owner of those crops. If I chop down trees in an unclaimed forest and use the wood to fashion a table, then that table will be mine. Locke places two important limitations on the way in which property can be acquired by mixing one’s labor with natural resources. First, there is what has come to be known as the Waste Proviso. One must not take so much property that some of it goes to waste. I should not appropriate gallons and gallons of grapes if I am only able to eat a few and the rest end up rotting. If the goods of the Earth were given to us by God, it would be inappropriate to allow some of this gift to go to waste. Second, there is the Enough-And-As-Good Proviso. This says that in appropriating resources I am required to leave enough and as good for others to appropriate. If the world was left to us in common by God, it would be wrong of me to appropriate more than my fair share and fail to leave sufficient resources for others.

After currency is introduced and after governments are established the nature of property obviously changes a great deal. Using metal, which can be made into coins and which does not perish the way foodstuffs and other goods do, individuals are able to accumulate much more wealth than would be possible otherwise. So the proviso concerning waste seems to drop away. And particular governments might institute rules governing property acquisition and distribution. Locke was aware of this and devoted a great deal of thought to the nature of property and the proper distribution of property within a commonwealth. His writings on economics, monetary policy, charity, and social welfare systems are evidence of this. But Locke’s views on property inside of a commonwealth have received far less attention than his views on the original acquisition of property in the state of nature.

c. Toleration

Locke had been systematically thinking about issues relating to religious toleration since his early years in London and even though he only published his Epistola de Tolerantia (A Letter Concerning Toleration) in 1689 he had finished writing it several years before. The question of whether or not a state should attempt to prescribe one particular religion within the state, what means states might use to do so, and what the correct attitude should be toward those who resist conversion to the official state religion had been central to European politics ever since the Protestant Reformation. Locke’s time in England, France, and the Netherlands had given him experiences of three very different approaches to these questions. These experiences had convinced him that, for the most part, individuals should be allowed to practice their religion without interference from the state. Indeed, part of the impetus for the publication of Locke’s Letter Concerning Toleration came from Louis XIV’s revocation of the Edict of Nantes, which took away the already limited rights of Protestants in France and exposed them to state persecution.

It is possible to see Locke’s arguments in favor of toleration as relating both to the epistemological views of the Essay and the political views of the Two Treatises. Relating to Locke’s epistemological views, recall from above that Locke thought the scope of human knowledge was extremely restricted. We might not be particularly good at determining what the correct religion is. There is no reason to think that those holding political power will be any better at discovering the true religion than anyone else, so they should not attempt to enforce their views on others. Instead, each individual should be allowed to pursue true beliefs as best as they are able. Little harm results from allowing others to have their own religious beliefs.  Indeed, it might be beneficial to allow a plurality of beliefs because one group might end up with the correct beliefs and win others over to their side.

Relating to Locke’s political views, as expressed in the Two Treatises, Locke endorses toleration on the grounds that the enforcement of religious conformity is outside the proper scope of government. People consent to governments for the purpose of establishing social order and the rule of law. Governments should refrain from enforcing religious conformity because doing so is unnecessary and irrelevant for these ends. Indeed, attempting to enforce conformity may positively harm these ends as it will likely lead to resistance from members of prohibited religions. Locke also suggests that governments should tolerate the religious beliefs of individual citizens because enforcing religious belief is actually impossible. Acceptance of a certain religion is an inward act, a function of one’s beliefs. But governments are designed to control people’s actions. So governments are, in many ways, ill-equipped to enforce the adoption of a particular religion because individual people have an almost perfect control of their own thoughts.

While Locke’s views on toleration were very progressive for the time and while his views do have an affinity with our contemporary consensus on the value of religious toleration it is important to recognize that Locke did place some severe limits on toleration. He did not think that we should tolerate the intolerant, those who would seek to forcibly impose their religious views on others. Similarly, any religious group who posed a threat to political stability or public safety should not be tolerated. Importantly, Locke included Roman Catholics in this group. On his view, Catholics had a fundamental allegiance to the Pope, a foreign prince who did not recognize the sovereignty of English law. This made Catholics a threat to civil government and peace. Finally, Locke also believed that atheists should not be tolerated. Because they did not believe they would be rewarded or punished for their actions in an afterlife, Locke did not think they could be trusted to behave morally or maintain their contractual obligations.

5. Theology

We have already seen that in the Essay Locke developed an account of belief according to faith and belief according to reason. Recall that an agent believes according to reason when she discovers something through the use of her natural faculties and she believes according to faith when she takes something as truth because she understands it to be a message from God. Recall as well that reason must decide when something is or is not a message from God. The goal of Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity is to show that it is reasonable to be a Christian. Locke argues that we do have sufficient reason to think that the central truths of Christianity were communicated to us by God through his messenger, Jesus of Nazareth.

For Locke’s project to succeed he needed to show that Jesus provided his original followers with sufficient evidence that he was a legitimate messenger from God. Given that numerous individuals in history had purported to be the recipients of divine revelation, there must be something special which set Jesus apart. Locke offers two considerations in this regard. The first is that Jesus fulfilled a number of historical predictions concerning the coming of a Messiah. The second is that Jesus performed a number of miracles which attest that he had a special relationship to God. Locke also claims that we have sufficient reason to believe that these miracles actually occurred on the basis of testimony from those who witnessed them first-hand and a reliable chain of reporting from Jesus’ time into our own. This argument leads Locke into a discussion of the types and value of testimony which many philosophers have found to be interesting in its own right.

One striking feature of The Reasonableness of Christianity is the requirement for salvation that Locke endorses. Disputes about which precise beliefs were necessary for salvation and eternal life in Heaven were at the core of much religious disagreement in Locke’s time. Different denominations and sects claimed that they, and often only they, had the correct beliefs. Locke, by contrast, argued that to be a true Christian and worthy of salvation an individual only need to believe one simple truth: that Jesus is the Messiah. Of course, Locke believed there were many other important truths in the Bible. But he thought these other truths, especially those contained in the Epistles rather than the Gospels, could be difficult to interpret and could lead to disputes and disagreement. The core tenet of Christianity, however, that Jesus is the Messiah, was a mandatory belief.

In making the requirements for Christian faith and salvation so minimal Locke was part of a growing faction in the Church of England. These individuals, often known as latitudinarians, were deliberately attempting to construct a more irenic Christianity with the goal of avoiding the conflict and controversy that previous internecine fights had produced. So Locke was hardly alone in attempting to find a set of core Christian commitments which were free of sectarian theological baggage. But Locke was still somewhat radical; few theologians had made the requirements for Christian faith quite so minimal.

6. Education

Locke was regarded by many in his time as an expert on educational matters. He taught many students at Oxford and also served as a private tutor. Locke’s correspondence shows that he was constantly asked to recommend tutors and offer pedagogical advice. Locke’s expertise led to his most important work on the subject: Some Thoughts Concerning Education. The work had its origins in a series of letters Locke wrote to Edward Clarke offering advice on the education of Clarke’s children and was first published in 1693.

Locke’s views on education were, for the time, quite forward-looking. Classical languages, usually learned through tedious exercises involving rote memorization, and corporeal punishment were two predominant features of the seventeenth century English educational system. Locke saw little use for either. Instead, he emphasized the importance of teaching practical knowledge. He recognized that children learn best when they are engaged with the subject matter. Locke also foreshadowed some contemporary pedagogical views by suggesting that children should be allowed some self-direction in their course of study and should have the ability to pursue their interests.

Locke believed it was important to take great care in educating the young. He recognized that habits and prejudices formed in youth could be very hard to break in later life. Thus, much of Some Thoughts Concerning Education focuses on morality and the best ways to inculcate virtue and industry. Locke rejected authoritarian approaches. Instead, he favored methods that would help children to understand the difference between right and wrong and to cultivate a moral sense of their own.

7. Locke’s Influence

The Essay was quickly recognized as an important philosophical contribution both by its admirers and by its critics. Before long it had been incorporated into the curriculum at Oxford and Cambridge and its translation into both Latin and French garnered it an audience on the Continent as well. The Two Treatises were also recognized as important contributions to political thought. While the work had some success in England among those favorably disposed to the Glorious Revolution, its primary impact was abroad. During the American Revolution (and to a lesser extent, during the French Revolution) Locke’s views were often appealed to by those seeking to establish more representative forms of government.

Related to this last point, Locke came to be seen, alongside his friend Newton, as an embodiment of Enlightenment values and ideals. Newtonian science would lay bare the workings of nature and lead to important technological advances. Lockean philosophy would lay bare the workings of men’s minds and lead to important reforms in law and government. Voltaire played an instrumental role in shaping this legacy for Locke and worked hard to publicize Locke’s views on reason, toleration, and limited government. Locke also came to be seen as an inspiration for the Deist movement. Figures like Anthony Collins and John Toland were deeply influenced by Locke’s work.

Locke is often recognized as the founder of British Empiricism and it is true that Locke laid the foundation for much of English-language philosophy in the 18th and early 19th centuries. But those who followed in his footsteps were not unquestioning followers. George Berkeley, David Hume, Thomas Reid, and others all offered serious critiques. In recent decades, readers have attempted to offer more charitable reconstructions of Locke’s philosophy. Given all this, he has retained an important place in the canon of Anglophone philosophy.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Locke’s Works

  • Laslett, P. [ed.] 1988. Two Treatises of Government. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Locke, J. 1823. The Works of John Locke. London: Printed for T. Tegg (10 volumes).
  • Locke, J. The Clarendon Edition of the Works of John Locke, Oxford University Press, 2015. This edition includes the following volumes:
  • Nidditch, P. [ed.] 1975. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Nidditch, P. and G.A.J. Rogers [eds.] 1990. Drafts for the Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Yolton, J.W. and J.S. Yolton. [eds.] 1989. Some Thoughts Concerning Education.
  • Higgins-Biddle, J.C. [ed.] 1999. The Reasonableness of Christianity.
  • Milton, J.R. and P. Milton. [eds.] 2006. An Essay Concerning Toleration.
  • de Beer, E.S. [ed.] 1976-1989. The Correspondence of John Locke. (8 volumes).
  • von Leyden, W. [ed.] 1954. Essays on the Law of Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

b. Recommended Reading

The following are recommendations for further reading on Locke. Each work has a brief statement indicating the contents

  • Anstey, P. 2011. John Locke & Natural Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • A thorough examination of Locke’s scientific and medical thinking.
  • Ayers, M.  1993. Locke: Epistemology and Ontology. New York: Routledge.
  • A classic in Locke studies. Explores philosophical topics in the Essay and discusses Locke’s project as a whole. One volume on epistemology and one on metaphysics.
  • Chappell, V. 1994. The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on all aspects of Locke’s thought.
  • LoLordo, A. 2012. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An exploration and discussion of themes at the intersection of Locke’s moral and political thought. Focuses particularly on agency, personhood, and rationality.
  • Lowe, E.J. 2005. Locke. New York: Routledge.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1976. Problems from Locke.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Uses Locke’s work to raise and discuss a number of philosophical issues and puzzles.
  • Newman, L. 2007. The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on specific issues in Locke’s Essay.
  • Pyle, A.J. 2013. Locke. London: Polity.
  • An excellent and brief introduction to Locke’s thought and historical context. A very good place to start for beginners.
  • Rickless, S. 2014. Locke. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Stuart, M. 2013. Locke’s Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An in-depth treatment of metaphysical issues and problems in the Essay.
  • Waldron, J. 2002. God, Locke, and Equality: Christian Foundation of Locke’s Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • An examination of some key issues in Locke’s political thought.
  • Woolhouse, R. 2009. Locke: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • The best and most recent biography of Locke’s life.

 

Author Information

Patrick J. Connolly
Email: pconnoll@iastate.edu
Iowa State University
U. S. A.

Immanuel Kant

kant2Towards the end of his most influential work, Critique of Pure Reason (1781/1787), Kant argues that all philosophy ultimately aims at answering these three questions: “What can I know? What should I do? What may I hope?” The book appeared at the beginning of the most productive period of his career, and by the end of his life Kant had worked out systematic, revolutionary, and often profound answers to these questions.

At the foundation of Kant’s system is the doctrine of “transcendental idealism,” which emphasizes a distinction between what we can experience (the natural, observable world) and what we cannot (“supersensible” objects such as God and the soul). Kant argued that we can only have knowledge of things we can experience. Accordingly, in answer to the question, “What can I know?” Kant replies that we can know the natural, observable world, but we cannot, however, have answers to many of the deepest questions of metaphysics.

Kant’s ethics are organized around the notion of a “categorical imperative,” which is a universal ethical principle stating that one should always respect the humanity in others, and that one should only act in accordance with rules that could hold for everyone. Kant argued that the moral law is a truth of reason, and hence that all rational creatures are bound by the same moral law. Thus in answer to the question, “What should I do?” Kant replies that we should act rationally, in accordance with a universal moral law.

Kant also argued that his ethical theory requires belief in free will, God, and the immortality of the soul. Although we cannot have knowledge of these things, reflection on the moral law leads to a justified belief in them, which amounts to a kind rational faith. Thus in answer to the question, “What may I hope?” Kant replies that we may hope that our souls are immortal and that there really is a God who designed the world in accordance with principles of justice.

In addition to these three focal points, Kant also made lasting contributions to nearly all areas of philosophy. His aesthetic theory remains influential among art critics. His theory of knowledge is required reading for many branches of analytic philosophy. The cosmopolitanism behind his political theory colors discourse about globalization and international relations. And some of his scientific contributions are even considered intellectual precursors to several ideas in contemporary cosmology.

This article presents an overview of these and other of Kant’s most important philosophical contributions. It follows standard procedures for citing Kant’s works. Passages from Critique of Pure Reason are cited by reference to page numbers in both the 1781 and 1787 editions. Thus “(A805/B833)” refers to page 805 in the 1781 edition and 833 in the 1787 edition. References to the rest of Kant’s works refer to the volume and page number of the official Deutsche Akademie editions of Kant’s works. Thus “(5:162)” refers to volume 5, page 162 of those editions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Metaphysics and Epistemology
    1. Pre-Critical Thought
    2. Dogmatic Slumber, Synthetic A Priori Knowledge, and the Copernican Shift
    3. The Cognitive Faculties and Their Representations
    4. Transcendental Idealism
      1. The Ideality of Space and Time
      2. Appearances and Things in Themselves
    5. The Deduction of the Categories
    6. Theory of Experience
    7. Critique of Transcendent Metaphysics
      1. The Soul (Paralogisms of Pure Reason)
      2. The World (Antinomies of Pure Reason)
      3. God (Ideal of Pure Reason)
  3. Philosophy of Mathematics
  4. Natural Science
    1. Physics
    2. Other Scientific Contributions
  5. Moral Theory
    1. The Good Will and Duty
    2. The Categorical Imperative
    3. Postulates of Practical Reason
  6. Political Theory and Theory of Human History
    1. Human History and the Age of Enlightenment
    2. Political Theory
    3. Perpetual Peace
  7. Theory of Art and Beauty
    1. The Beautiful and the Sublime
    2. Theory of Art
    3. Relation to Moral Theory
  8. Pragmatic Anthropology
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Kant was born in 1724 in the Prussian city of Königsberg (now Kaliningrad in Russia). His parents – Johann Georg and Anna Regina – were pietists. Although they raised Kant in this tradition (an austere offshoot of Lutheranism that emphasized humility and divine grace), he does not appear ever to have been very sympathetic to this kind of religious devotion. As a youth, he attended the Collegium Fridericianum in Königsberg, after which he attended the University of Königsberg. Although he initially focused his studies on the classics, philosophy soon caught and held his attention. The rationalism of Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) and Christian Wolff (1679-1754) was most influential on him during these early years, but Kant was also introduced to Isaac Newton’s (1642-1727) writings during this time.

His mother had died in 1737, and after his father’s death in 1746 Kant left the University to work as a private tutor for several families in the countryside around the city. He returned to the University in 1754 to teach as a Privatdozent, which meant that he was paid directly by individual students, rather than by the University. He supported himself in this way until 1770. Kant published many essays and other short works during this period. He made minor scientific contributions in astronomy, physics, and earth science, and wrote philosophical treatises engaging with the Leibnizian-Wolffian traditions of the day (many of these are discussed below). Kant’s primary professional goal during this period was to eventually attain the position of Professor of Logic and Metaphysics at Königsberg. He finally succeeded in 1770 (at the age of 46) when he completed his second dissertation (the first had been published in 1755), which is now referred to as the Inaugural Dissertation.

Commentators divide Kant’s career into the “pre-critical” period before 1770 and the “critical” period after. After the publication of the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant published hardly anything for more than a decade (this period is referred to as his “silent decade”). However, this was anything but a fallow period for Kant. After discovering and being shaken by the radical skepticism of Hume’s empiricism in the early 1770s, Kant undertook a massive project to respond to Hume. He realized that this response would require a complete reorientation of the most fundamental approaches to metaphysics and epistemology. Although it took much longer than initially planned, his project came to fruition in 1781 with the publication of the first edition of Critique of Pure Reason

The 1780s would be the most productive years of Kant’s career. In addition to writing the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783) as a sort of introduction to the Critique, Kant wrote important works in ethics (Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, 1785, and Critique of Practical Reason, 1788), he applied his theoretical philosophy to Newtonian physical theory (Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, 1786), and he substantially revised the Critique of Pure Reason in 1787. Kant capped the decade with the publication of the third and final critique, Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790).

Although the products of the 1780s are the works for which Kant is best known, he continued to publish philosophical writings through the 1790s as well. Of note during this period are Religion within the Bounds of Mere Reason (1793), Towards Perpetual Peace (1795), Metaphysics of Morals (1797), and Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798). The Religion was attended with some controversy, and Kant was ultimately led to promise the King of Prussia (Friedrich Wilhelm II) not to publish anything else on religion. (Kant considered the promise null and void after the king died in 1797.) During his final years, he devoted himself to completing the critical project with one final bridge to physical science. Unfortunately, the encroaching dementia of Kant’s final years prevented him from completing this book (partial drafts are published under the title Opus Postumum).

Kant never married and there are many stories that paint him as a quirky but dour eccentric. These stories do not do him justice. He was beloved by his friends and colleagues. He was consistently generous to all those around him, including his servants. He was universally considered a lively and engaging dinner guest and (later in life) host. And he was a devoted and popular teacher throughout the five decades he spent in the classroom. Although he had hoped for a small, private ceremony, when he died in 1804, age 79, his funeral was attended by the thousands who wished to pay their respects to “the sage of Königsberg.”

2. Metaphysics and Epistemology

The most important element of Kant’s mature metaphysics and epistemology is his doctrine of transcendental idealism, which received its fullest discussion in Critique of Pure Reason (1781/87). Transcendental idealism is the thesis that the empirical world that we experience (the “phenomenal” world of “appearances”) is to be distinguished from the world of things as they are in themselves. The most significant aspect of this distinction is that while the empirical world exists in space and time, things in themselves are neither spatial nor temporal. Transcendental idealism has wide-ranging consequences. On the positive side, Kant takes transcendental idealism to entail an “empirical realism,” according to which humans have direct epistemic access to the natural, physical world and can even have a priori cognition of basic features of all possible experienceable objects. On the negative side, Kant argues that we cannot have knowledge of things in themselves. Further, since traditional metaphysics deals with things in themselves, answers to the questions of traditional metaphysics (for example, regarding God or free will) can never be answered by human minds.

This section addresses the development of Kant’s metaphysics and epistemology and then summarizes the most important arguments and conclusions of Kant’s theory.

a. Pre-Critical Thought

Critique of Pure Reason, the book that would alter the course of western philosophy, was written by a man already far into his career. Unlike the later “critical period” Kant, the philosophical output of the early Kant was fully enmeshed in the German rationalist tradition, which was dominated at the time by the writings of Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) and Christian Wolff (1679-1754). Nevertheless, many of Kant’s concerns during the pre-critical period anticipate important aspects of his mature thought.

Kant’s first purely philosophical work was the New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition (1755). The first parts of this long essay present criticisms and revisions of the Wolffian understanding of the basic principles of metaphysics, especially the Principles of Identity (whatever is, is, and whatever is not, is not), of Contradiction (nothing can both be and not be), and of Sufficient Reason (nothing is true without a reason why it is true). In the final part, Kant defends two original principles of metaphysics. According to the “Principle of Succession,” all change in objects requires the mutual interaction of a plurality of substances. This principle is a metaphysical analogue of Newton’s principle of action and reaction, and it anticipates Kant’s argument in the Third Analogy of Experience from Critique of Pure Reason (see 2f below). According to the “Principle of Coexistence,” multiple substances can only be said to coexist within the same world if the unity of that world is grounded in the intellect of God. Although Kant would later claim that we can never have metaphysical cognition of this sort of relation between God and the world (not least of all because we can’t even know that God exists), he would nonetheless continue to be occupied with the question of how multiple distinct substances can constitute a single, unified world.

In the Physical Monadology (1756), Kant attempts to provide a metaphysical account of the basic constitution of material substance in terms of “monads.” Leibniz and Wolff had held that monads are the simple, atomic substances that constitute matter. Kant follows Wolff in rejecting Leibniz’s claim that monads are mindlike and that they do not interact with each other. The novel aspect of Kant’s account lies in his claim that each monad possesses a degree of both attractive and repulsive force, and that monads fill determinate volumes of space because of the interactions between these monads as they compress each other through their opposed repulsive forces. Thirty years later, in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786), Kant would develop the theory that matter must be understood in terms of interacting attractive and repulsive forces. The primary difference between the later view and the earlier is that Kant no longer appeals to monads, or simple substances at all (transcendental idealism rules out the possibility of simplest substances as constituents of matter; see 2gii below).

The final publication of Kant’s pre-critical period was On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World, also referred to as the Inaugural Dissertation (1770), since it marked Kant’s appointment as Königsberg’s Professor of Logic and Metaphysics. Although Kant had not yet had the final crucial insights that would lead to the development of transcendental idealism, many of the important elements of his mature metaphysics are prefigured here. Two aspects of the Inaugural Dissertation are especially worth noting. First, in a break from his predecessors, Kant distinguishes two fundamental faculties of the mind: sensibility, which represents the world through singular “intuitions,” and understanding, which represents the world through general “concepts.” In the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant argues that sensibility represents the sensible world of “phenomena” while the understanding represents an intelligible world of “noumena.” The critical period Kant will deny that we can have any determinate knowledge of noumena, and that knowledge of phenomena requires the cooperation of sensibility and understanding together. Second, in describing the “form” of the sensible world, Kant argues that space and time are “not something objective and real,” but are rather “subjective and ideal” (2:403). The claim that space and time pertain to things only as they appear, not as they are in themselves, will be one of the central theses of Kant’s mature transcendental idealism.

b. Dogmatic Slumber, Synthetic A Priori Knowledge, and the Copernican Shift

Although the early Kant showed a complete willingness to dissent from many important aspects of the Wolffian orthodoxy of the time, Kant continued to take for granted the basic rationalist assumption that metaphysical cognition was possible. In a retrospective remark from the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783), Kant says that his faith in this rationalist assumption was shaken by David Hume (1711-1776), whose skepticism regarding the possibility of knowledge of causal necessary connections awoke Kant from his “dogmatic slumber” (4:260). Hume argued that we can never have knowledge of necessary connections between causes and effects because such knowledge can neither be given through the senses, nor derived a priori as conceptual truths. Kant realized that Hume’s problem was a serious one because his skepticism about knowledge of the necessity of the connection between cause and effect generalized to all metaphysical knowledge pertaining to necessity, not just causation specifically. For instance, there is the question why mathematical truths necessarily hold true in the natural world, or the question whether we can know that a being (God) exists necessarily.

The solution to Hume’s skepticism, which would form the basis of the critical philosophy, was twofold. The first part of Kant’s solution was to agree with Hume that metaphysical knowledge (such as knowledge of causation) is neither given through the senses, nor is it known a priori through conceptual analysis. Kant argued, however, that there is a third kind of knowledge which is a priori, yet which is not known simply by analyzing concepts. He referred to this as “synthetic a priori knowledge.” Where analytic judgments are justified by the semantic relations between the concepts they mention (for example, “all bachelors are unmarried”), synthetic judgments are justified by their conformity to the given object that they describe (for example, “this ball right here is red”). The puzzle posed by the notion of synthetic a priori knowledge is that it would require that an object be presented to the mind, but not be given in sensory experience.

The second part of Kant’s solution is to explain how synthetic a priori knowledge could be possible. He describes his key insight on this matter as a “Copernican” shift in his thinking about the epistemic relation between the mind and the world. Copernicus had realized that it only appeared as though the sun and stars revolved around us, and that we could have knowledge of the way the solar system really was if we took into account the fact that the sky looks the way it does because we perceivers are moving. Analogously, Kant realized that we must reject the belief that the way things appear corresponds to the way things are in themselves. Furthermore, he argued that the objects of knowledge can only ever be things as they appear, not as they are in themselves. Appealing to this new approach to metaphysics and epistemology, Kant argued that we must investigate the most basic structures of experience (that is, the structures of the way things appear to us), because the basic structures of experience will coincide with the basic structures of any objects that could possibly be experienced. In other words, if it is only possible to have experience of an object if the object conforms to the conditions of experience, then knowing the conditions of experience will give us knowledge – synthetic a priori knowledge in fact – of every possible object of experience. Kant overcomes Hume’s skepticism by showing that we can have synthetic a priori knowledge of objects in general when we take as the object of our investigation the very form of a possible object of experience. Critique of Pure Reason is an attempt to work through all of the important details of this basic philosophical strategy.

c. The Cognitive Faculties and Their Representations

Kant’s theory of the mind is organized around an account of the mind’s powers, its “cognitive faculties.” One of Kant’s central claims is that the cognitive capacities of the mind depend on two basic and fundamentally distinct faculties. First, there is “sensibility.” Sensibility is a passive faculty because its job is to receive representations through the affection of objects on the senses. Through sensibility, objects are “given” to the mind. Second, there is “understanding,” which is an active faculty whose job is to “think” (that is, apply concepts to) the objects given through sensibility.

The most basic type of representation of sensibility is what Kant calls an “intuition.” An intuition is a representation that refers directly to a singular individual object. There are two types of intuitions. Pure intuitions are a priori representations of space and time themselves (see 2d1 below). Empirical intuitions are a posteriori representations that refer to specific empirical objects in the world. In addition to possessing a spatiotemporal “form,” empirical intuitions also involve sensation, which Kant calls the “matter” of intuition (and of experience generally). (Without sensations, the mind could never have thoughts about real things, only possible ones.) We have empirical intuitions both of objects in the physical world (“outer intuitions”) and objects in our own minds (“inner intuitions”).

The most basic type of representation of understanding is the “concept.” Unlike an intuition, a concept is a representation that refers generally to indefinitely many objects. (For instance, the concept ‘cat’ on its own could refer to any and all cats, but not to any one in particular.) Concepts refer to their objects only indirectly because they depend on intuitions for reference to particular objects. As with intuitions, there are two basic types of concepts. Pure concepts are a priori representations and they characterize the most basic logical structure of the mind. Kant calls these concepts “categories.” Empirical concepts are a posteriori representations, and they are formed on the basis of sensory experience with the world. Concepts are combined by the understanding into “judgments,” which are the smallest units of knowledge. I can only have full cognition of an object in the world once I have, first, had an empirical intuition of the object, second, conceptualized this object in some way, and third, formed my conceptualization of the intuited object into a judgment. This means that both sensibility and understanding must work in cooperation for knowledge to be possible. As Kant expresses it, “Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (A51/B75).

There are two other important cognitive faculties that must be mentioned. The first is transcendental “imagination,” which mediates between sensibility and understanding. Kant calls this faculty “blind” because we do not have introspective access to its operations. Kant says that we can at least know that it is responsible for forming intuitions in such a way that it is possible for the understanding to apply concepts to them. The other is “reason,” which operates in a way similar to the understanding, but which operates independently of the senses. While understanding combines the data of the senses into judgments, reason combines understanding’s judgments together into one coherent, unified, systematic whole. Reason is not satisfied with mere disconnected bits of knowledge. Reason wants all knowledge to form a system of knowledge. Reason is also the faculty responsible for the “illusions” of transcendent metaphysics (see 2g below).

d. Transcendental Idealism

Transcendental idealism is a theory about the relation between the mind and its objects. Three fundamental theses make up this theory: first, there is a distinction between appearances (things as they appear) and things as they are in themselves. Second, space and time are a priori, subjective conditions on the possibility of experience, and hence they pertain only to appearances, not to things in themselves. Third, we can have determinate cognition of only of things that can be experienced, hence only of appearances, not things in themselves.

A quick remark on the term “transcendental idealism” is in order. Kant typically uses the term “transcendental” when he wants to emphasize that something is a condition on the possibility of experience. So for instance, the chapter titled “Transcendental Analytic of Concepts” deals with the concepts without which cognition of an object would be impossible.  Kant uses the term “idealism” to indicate that the objects of experience are mind-dependent (although the precise sense of this mind-dependence is controversial; see 2d2 below). Hence, transcendental idealism is the theory that it is a condition on the possibility of experience that the objects of experience be in some sense mind-dependent.

i. The Ideality of Space and Time

Kant argues that space and time are a priori, subjective conditions on the possibility of experience, that is, that they are transcendentally ideal. Kant grounds the distinction between appearances and things in themselves on the realization that, as subjective conditions on experience, space and time could only characterize things as they appear, not as they are in themselves. Further, the claim that we can only know appearances (not things in themselves) is a consequence of the claims that we can only know objects that conform to the conditions of experience, and that only spatiotemporal appearances conform to these conditions. Given the systematic importance of this radical claim, what were Kant’s arguments for it? What follows are some of Kant’s most important arguments for the thesis.

One argument has to do with the relation between sensations and space. Kant argues that sensations on their own are not spatial, but that they (or arguably the objects they correspond to) are represented in space, “outside and next to one another” (A23/B34). Hence, the ability to sense objects in space presupposes the a priori representation of space, which entails that space is merely ideal, hence not a property of things in themselves.

Another argument that Kant makes repeatedly during the critical period can be called the “argument from geometry.” Its two premises are, first, that the truths of geometry are necessary truths, and thus a priori truths, and second, that the truths of geometry are synthetic (because these truths cannot be derived from an analysis of the meanings of geometrical concepts). If geometry, which is the study of the structure of space, is synthetic a priori, then its object – space – must be a mere a priori representation and not something that pertains to things in themselves. (Kant’s theory of mathematical cognition is discussed further in 3b below.)

Many commentators have found these arguments less than satisfying because they depend on the questionable assumption that if the representations of space and time are a priori they thereby cannot be properties of things in themselves. “Why can’t it be both?” many want to ask. A stronger argument appears in Kant’s discussion of the First and Second Antinomies of Pure Reason (discussed below, 2g2). There Kant argues that if space and time were things in themselves or even properties of things in themselves, then one could prove that space and time both are and are not infinitely large, and that matter in space both is and is not infinitely divisible. In other words, the assumption that space and time are transcendentally real instead of transcendentally ideal leads to a contradiction, and thus space and time must be transcendentally ideal.

ii. Appearances and Things in Themselves

How Kant’s distinction between appearances and things in themselves should be understood is one of the most controversial topics in the literature. It is a question of central importance because how one understands this distinction determines how one will understand the entire nature of Kantian idealism. The following briefly summarizes the main interpretive options, but it does not take a stand on which is correct.

According to “two-world” interpretations, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is to be understood in metaphysical and ontological terms. Appearances (and hence the entire physical world that we experience) comprise one set of entities, and things in themselves are an ontologically distinct set of entities. Although things in themselves may somehow cause us to have experience of appearances, the appearances we experience are not things in themselves.

According to “one-world” or “two-aspect” interpretations, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is to be understood in epistemological terms. Appearances are ontologically the very same things as things in themselves, and the phrase “in themselves” simply means “not considered in terms of their epistemic relation to human perceivers.”

A common objection against two-world interpretations is that they may make Kant’s theory too similar to Berkeley’s immaterialist idealism (an association from which Kant vehemently tried to distance himself), and they seem to ignore Kant’s frequent characterization of the appearance/thing in itself distinction in terms of different epistemic standpoints. And a common objection against one-world interpretations is that they may trivialize some of the otherwise revolutionary aspects of Kant’s theory, and they seem to ignore Kant’s frequent characterization of the appearance/thing in itself distinction in seemingly metaphysical terms. There have been attempts at interpretations that are intermediate between these two options. For instance, some have argued that Kant only acknowledges one world, but that the appearance/thing in itself distinction is nevertheless metaphysical, not merely epistemological.

e. The Deduction of the Categories

After establishing the ideality of space and time and the distinction between appearances and things in themselves, Kant goes on to show how it is possible to have a priori cognition of the necessary features of appearances. Cognizing appearances requires more than mere knowledge of their sensible form (space and time); it also requires that we be able to apply certain concepts (for example, the concept of causation) to appearances. Kant identifies the most basic concepts that we can use to think about objects as the “pure concepts of understanding,” or the “categories.”

There are twelve categories in total, and they fall into four groups of three:

Kant_overview_graphic

 

 

 

 

 

 

 

 

 

 

 

 

The task of the chapter titled “Transcendental Deduction of the Categories” is to show that these categories can and must be applied in some way to any object that could possibly be an object of experience. The argument of the Transcendental Deduction is one of the most important moments in the Critique, but it is also one of the most difficult, complex, and controversial arguments in the book. Hence, it will not be possible to reconstruct the argument in any detail here. Instead, Kant’s most important claims and moves in the Deduction are described.

Kant’s argument turns on conceptions of self-consciousness (or what he calls “apperception”) as a condition on the possibility of experiencing the world as a unified whole. Kant takes it to be uncontroversial that we can be aware of our representations as our representations. It is not just that I can have the thoughts ‘P’ or ‘Q’; I am also always able to ascribe these thoughts to myself: ‘I think P’ and ‘I think Q’. Further, we are also able to recognize that it is the same I that does the thinking in both cases. Thus, we can recognize that ‘I think both P and Q’. In general, all of our experience is unified because it can be ascribed to the one and same I, and so this unity of experience depends on the unity of the self-conscious I. Kant next asks what conditions must obtain in order for this unity of self-consciousness to be possible. His answer is that we must be able to differentiate between the I that does the thinking and the object that we think about. That is, we must be able to distinguish between subjective and objective elements in our experience. If we could not make such a distinction, then all experience would just be so many disconnected mental happenings: everything would be subjective and there would be no “unity of apperception” that stands over and against the various objects represented by the I. So next Kant needs to explain how we are able to differentiate between the subjective and objective elements of experience. His answer is that a representation is objective when the subject is necessitated in representing the object in a certain way, that is, when it is not up to the free associative powers of my imagination to determine how I represent it. For instance, whether I think a painting is attractive or whether it calls to mind an instance from childhood depends on the associative activity of my own imagination; but the size of the canvas and the chemical composition of the pigments is not up to me: insofar as I represent these as objective features of the painting, I am necessitated in representing them in a certain way. In order for a representational content to be necessitated in this way, according to Kant, is for it to be subject to a “rule.” The relevant rules that Kant has in mind are the conditions something must satisfy in order for it to be represented as an object at all. And these conditions are precisely the concepts laid down in the schema of the categories, which are the concepts of an “object in general.” Hence, if I am to have experience at all, I must conceptualize objects in terms of the a priori categories.

Kant’s argument in the Deduction is a “transcendental argument”: Kant begins with a premise accepted by everyone, but then asks what conditions must have been met in order for this premise to be true. Kant assumed that we have a unified experience of the many objects populating the world. This unified experience depends on the unity of apperception. The unity of apperception enables the subject to distinguish between subjective and objective elements in experience. This ability, in turn, depends on representing objects in accordance with rules, and the rules in question are the categories. Hence, the only way we can explain the fact that we have experience at all is by appeal to the fact that the categories apply to the objects of experience.

It is worth emphasizing how truly radical the conclusion of the Transcendental Deduction is. Kant takes himself to have shown that all of nature is subject to the rules laid down by the categories. But these categories are a priori: they originate in the mind. This means that the order and regularity we encounter in the natural world is made possible by the mind’s own construction of nature and its order. Thus the conclusion of the Transcendental Deduction parallels the conclusion of the Transcendental Aesthetic: where the latter had shown that the forms of sensibility (space and time) originate in the mind and are imposed on the world, the former shows that the forms of understanding (the categories) also originate in the mind and are imposed on the world.

f. Theory of Experience

The Transcendental Deduction showed that it is necessary for us to make use of the categories in experience, but also that we are justified in making use of them. In the following series of chapters (together labeled the Analytic of Principles) Kant attempts to leverage the results of the Deduction and prove that there are transcendentally necessary laws that every possible object of experience must obey. He refers to these as “principles of pure understanding.” These principles are synthetic a priori in the sense defined above (see 2b), and they are transcendental conditions on the possibility of experience.

The first two principles correspond to the categories of quantity and quality. First, Kant argues that every object of experience must have a determinate spatial shape and size and a determinate temporal duration (except mental objects, which have no spatial determinations). Second, Kant argues that every object of experience must contain a “matter” that fills out the object’s extensive magnitude. This matter must be describable as an “intensive magnitude.” Extensive magnitudes are represented through the intuition of the object (the form of the representation) and intensive magnitudes are represented by the sensations that fill out the intuition (the matter of the representation).

The next three principles are discussed in an important, lengthy chapter called the Analogies of Experience. They derive from the relational categories: substance, causality, and community. According to the First Analogy, experience will always involve objects that must be represented as substances. “Substance” here is to be understood in terms of an object that persists permanently as a “substratum” and which is the bearer of impermanent “accidents.” According to the Second Analogy, every event must have a cause. One event is said to be the cause of another when the second event follows the first in accordance with a rule. And according to the Third Analogy (which presupposes the first two), all substances stand in relations of reciprocal interaction with each other. That is, any two pieces of material substance will effect some degree of causal influence on each other, even if they are far apart.

The principles of the Analogies of Experience are important metaphysical principles, and if Kant’s arguments for them are successful, they mark significant advances in the metaphysical investigation of nature. The First Analogy is a form of the principle of the conservation of matter: it shows that matter can never be created or annihilated by natural means, it can only be altered. The Second Analogy is a version of the principle of sufficient reason applied to experience (causes being sufficient reasons for their effects), and it represents Kant’s refutation of Hume’s skepticism regarding causation. Hume had argued that we can never have knowledge of necessary connections between events; rather, we can only perceive certain types of events to be constantly conjoined with other types of events. In arguing that events follow each other in accordance with rules, Kant has shown how we can have knowledge of necessary connections between events above and beyond their mere constant conjunction. Lastly, Kant probably intended the Third Analogy to establish a transcendental, a priori basis for something like Newton’s law of universal gravitation, which says that no matter how far apart two objects are they will exert some degree of gravitational influence on each other.

The Postulates of Empirical Thinking in General contains the final set of principles of pure understanding and they derive from the modal categories (possibility, actuality, necessity). The Postulates define the different ways to represent the modal status of objects, that is, what it is for an object of experience to be possible, actual, or necessary.

The most important passage from the Postulates chapter is the Refutation of Idealism, which is a refutation of external world skepticism that Kant added to the 1787 edition of the Critique. Kant had been annoyed by reviews of the first edition that unfavorably compared his transcendental idealism with Berkeley’s immaterialist idealism. In the Refutation, Kant argues that his system entails not just that an external (that is, spatial) world is possible (which Berkeley denied), but that we can know it is real (which Descartes and others questioned). Kant’s argumentative strategy in the Refutation is ingenious but controversial. Where the skeptics assume that we have knowledge of the states of our own minds, but say that we cannot be certain that an external world corresponds to these states, Kant turns the tables and argues that we would not have knowledge of the states of our own minds (specifically, the temporal order in which our ideas occur) if we were not simultaneously aware of permanent substances in space, outside of the mind. The precise structure of Kant’s argument, as well as the question how successful it is, continues to be a matter of heated debate in the literature.

g. Critique of Transcendent Metaphysics

One of the most important upshots of Kant’s theory of experience is that it is possible to have knowledge of the world because the world as we experience it conforms to the conditions on the possibility of experience. Accordingly, Kant holds that there can be knowledge of an object only if it is possible for that object to be given in an experience. This aspect of the epistemological condition of the human subject entails that there are important areas of inquiry about which we would like to have knowledge, but cannot. Most importantly, Kant argued that transcendent metaphysics, that is, philosophical inquiry into “supersensible” objects that are not a part of the empirical world, marks a philosophical dead end. (Note: There is a subtle but important difference between the terms “transcendental” and “transcendent” for Kant. “Transcendental” describes conditions on the possibility of experience. “Transcendent” describes unknowable objects in the “noumenal” realm of things in themselves.)

Kant calls the basic concepts of metaphysical inquiry “ideas.” Unlike concepts of the understanding, which correspond to possible objects that can be given in experience, ideas are concepts of reason, and they do not correspond to possible objects of experience. The three most important ideas with which Kant is concerned in the Transcendental Dialectic are the soul, the world (considered as a totality), and God. The peculiar thing about these ideas of reason is that reason is led by its very structure to posit objects corresponding to these ideas. It cannot help but do this because reason’s job is to unify cognitions into a systematic whole, and it finds that it needs these ideas of the soul, the world, and God, in order to complete this systematic unification. Kant refers to reason’s inescapable tendency to posit unexperienceable and hence unknowable objects corresponding to these ideas as “transcendental illusion.”

Kant presents his analysis of transcendental illusion and his critique of transcendent metaphysics in the series of chapters titled “Transcendental Dialectic,” which takes up the majority of the second half of Critique of Pure Reason. This section summarizes Kant’s most important arguments from the Dialectic.

i. The Soul (Paralogisms of Pure Reason)

Kant addresses the metaphysics of the soul – an inquiry he refers to as “rational psychology” – in the Paralogisms of Pure Reason. Rational psychology, as Kant describes it, is the attempt to prove metaphysical theses about the nature of the soul through an analysis of the simple proposition, “I think.” Many of Kant’s rationalist predecessors and contemporaries had thought that reflection on the notion of the “I” in the proposition “I think” would reveal that the I is necessarily a substance (which would mean that the I is a soul), an indivisible unity (which some would use to prove the immortality of the soul), self-identical (which is relevant to questions regarding personal identity), and distinct from the external world (which can lead to external-world skepticism). Kant argues that such reasoning is the result of transcendental illusion.

Transcendental illusion in rational psychology arises when the mere thought of the I in the proposition “I think” is mistaken for a cognition of the I as an object. (A cognition involves both intuition and concept, while a mere thought involves only concept.) For instance, consider the question whether we can cognize the I as a substance (that is, as a soul). On the one hand, something is cognized as a substance when it is represented only as the subject of predication and is never itself the predicate of some other subject. The I of “I think” is always represented as subject (the I’s various thoughts are its predicates). On the other hand, something can only be cognized as a substance when it is given as a persistent object in an intuition (see 2f above), and there can be no intuition of the I itself. Hence although we cannot help but think of the I as a substantial soul, we can never have cognition of the I as a substance, and hence knowledge of the existence and nature of the soul is impossible.

ii. The World (Antinomies of Pure Reason)

The Antinomies of Pure Reason deal with “rational cosmology,” that is, with metaphysical inquiry into the nature of the cosmos considered as a totality. An “antinomy” is a conflict of reason with itself. Antinomies arise when reason seems to be able to prove two opposed and mutually contradictory propositions with apparent certainty. Kant discusses four antinomies in the first Critique (he uncovers other antinomies in later writings as well). The First Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that the universe is both finite and infinite in space and time. The Second Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that matter both is and is not infinitely divisible into ever smaller parts. The Third Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that free will cannot be a causally efficacious part of the world (because all of nature is deterministic) and yet that it must be such a cause. And the Fourth Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that there is and there is not a necessary being (which some would identify with God).

In all four cases, Kant attempts to resolve these conflicts of reason with itself by appeal to transcendental idealism. The claim that space and time are not features of things in themselves is used to resolve the First and Second Antinomies. Since the empirical world in space and time is identified with appearances, and since the world as a totality can never itself be given as a single appearance, there is no determinate fact of the matter regarding the size of the universe: It is neither determinately finite nor determinately infinite; rather, it is indefinitely large. Similarly, matter has neither simplest atoms (or “monads”) nor is it infinitely divided; rather, it is indefinitely divisible.

The distinction between appearances and things in themselves is used to resolve the Third and Fourth Antinomies. Although every empirical event experienced within the realm of appearance has a deterministic natural cause, it is at least logically possible that freedom can be a causally efficacious power at the level of things in themselves. And although every empirical object experienced within the realm of appearance is a contingently existing entity, it is logically possible that there is a necessary being outside the realm of appearance which grounds the existence of the contingent beings within the realm of appearance. It must be kept in mind that Kant has not claimed to demonstrate the existence of a transcendent free will or a transcendent necessary being: Kant denies the possibility of knowledge of things in themselves. Instead, Kant only takes himself to have shown that the existence of such entities is logically possible. In his moral theory, however, Kant will offer an argument for the actuality of freedom (see 5c below).

iii. God (Ideal of Pure Reason)

The Ideal of Pure Reason addresses the idea of God and argues that it is impossible to prove the existence of God. The argumentation in the Ideal of Pure Reason was anticipated in Kant’s The Only Possible Argument in Support of the Existence of God (1763), making this aspect of Kant’s mature thought one of the most significant remnants of the pre-critical period.

Kant identifies the idea of God with the idea of an ens realissimum, or “most real being.” This most real being is also considered by reason to be a necessary being, that is, something which exists necessarily instead of merely contingently. Reason is led to posit the idea of such a being when it reflects on its conceptions of finite beings with limited reality and infers that the reality of finite beings must derive from and depend on the reality of the most infinitely perfect being. Of course, the fact that reason necessarily thinks of a most real, necessary being does not entail that such a being exists. Kant argues that there are only three possible arguments for the existence of such a being, and that none is successful.

According to the ontological argument for the existence of God (versions of which were proposed by St. Anselm (1033-1109) and Descartes (1596-1650), among others), God is the only being whose essence entails its existence. Kant famously objects that this argument mistakenly treats existence as a “real predicate.” According to Kant, when I make an assertion of the form “x is necessarily F,” all I can mean is that “if x exists, then x must be F.” Thus when proponents of the ontological argument claim that the idea of God entails that “God necessarily exists,” all they can mean is that “if God exists, then God exists,” which is an empty tautology.

Kant also offers lengthy criticisms of the cosmological argument (the existence of contingent beings entails the existence of a necessary being) and the physico-theological argument, which is also referred to as the “argument from design” (the order and purposiveness in the empirical world can only be explained by a divine creator). Kant argues that both of these implicitly depend on the argumentation of the ontological argument pertaining to necessary existence, and since it fails, they fail as well.

Although Kant argues in the Transcendental Dialectic that we cannot have cognition of the soul, of freedom of the will, nor of God, in his ethical writings he will complicate this story and argue that we are justified in believing in these things (see 5c below).

3. Philosophy of Mathematics

The distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments (see 2b above) is necessary for understanding Kant’s theory of mathematics. Recall that an analytic judgment is one where the truth of the judgment depends only on the relation between the concepts used in the judgment. The truth of a synthetic judgment, by contrast, requires that an object be “given” in sensibility and that the concepts used in the judgment be combined in the object. In these terms, most of Kant’s predecessors took mathematical truths to be analytic truths. Kant, by contrast argued that mathematical knowledge is synthetic. It may seem surprising that one’s knowledge of mathematical truths depends on an object being given in sensibility, for we surely don’t arrive at mathematical knowledge by empirical means. Recall, however, that a judgment can be both synthetic yet a priori. Like the judgments of the necessary structures of experience, mathematics is also synthetic a priori according to Kant.

To make this point, Kant considers the proposition ‘7+5=12’. Surely, this proposition is a priori: I can know its truth without doing empirical experiments to see what happens when I put seven things next to five other things. More to the point, ‘7+5=12’ must be a priori because it is a necessary truth, and empirical judgments are always merely contingent according to Kant. Yet at the same time, the judgment is not analytic because, “The concept of twelve is by no means already thought merely by my thinking of that unification of seven and five, and no matter how long I analyze my concept of such a possible sum I will still not find twelve in it” (B15).

If mathematical knowledge is synthetic, then it depends on objects being given in sensibility. And if it is a priori, then these objects must be non-empirical objects. What sort of objects does Kant have in mind here? The answer lies in Kant’s theory of the pure forms of intuition (space and time). Recall that an intuition is a singular, immediate representation of an individual object (see 2c above). Empirical intuitions represent sensible objects through sensation, but pure intuitions are a priori representations of space and time as such. These pure intuitions of space and time provide the objects of mathematics through what Kant calls a “construction” of concepts in pure intuition. As he puts it, “to construct a concept means to exhibit a priori the intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741). A mathematical concept (for example, ‘triangle’) can be thought of as a rule for how to make an object that corresponds to that concept. Thus if ‘triangle’ is defined as ‘three-sided, two-dimensional shape’, then I construct a triangle in pure intuition when I imagine three lines coming together to form a two-dimensional figure. These pure constructions in intuition can be used to arrive at (synthetic, a priori) mathematical knowledge. Consider the proposition, ‘The angles of a triangle sum to 180 degrees’. When I construct a triangle in intuition in accordance with the rule ‘three-sided, two-dimensional shape’, then the constructed triangle will in fact have angles that sum to 180 degrees. And this will be true irrespective of what particular triangle I constructed (isosceles, scalene, and so forth.). Kant holds that all mathematical knowledge is derived in this fashion: I take a concept, construct it in pure intuition, and then determine what features of the constructed intuition are necessarily true of it.

4. Natural Science

In addition to his work in pure theoretical philosophy, Kant displayed an active interest in the natural sciences throughout his career. Most of his important scientific contributions were in the physical sciences (including not just physics proper, but also earth sciences and cosmology). In Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) he also presented a lengthy discussion of the philosophical basis of the study of biological entities.

In general, Kant thought that a body of knowledge could only count as a science in the true sense if it could admit of mathematical description and an a priori principle that could be “presented a priori in intuition” (4:471). Hence, Kant was pessimistic about the possibility of empirical psychology ever amounting to a true science. Kant even thought it might be the case that “chemistry can be nothing more than a systematic art or experimental doctrine, but never a proper science” (4:471).

This section focuses primarily on Kant’s physics (4a), but it also lists several of Kant’s other scientific contributions (4b).

a. Physics

Kant’s interest in physical theory began early. His first published work, Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces (1749) was an inquiry into some foundational problems in physics, and it entered into the “vis viva” (“living forces”) debate between Leibniz and the Cartesians regarding how to quantify force in moving objects (for the most part, Kant sided with the Leibnizians). A few years later, Kant wrote the Physical Monadology (1756), which dealt with other foundational questions in physics (see 2a above.)

Kant’s mature physical theory is presented in its fullest form in Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786). This theory can be understood as an outgrowth and consequence of the transcendental theory of experience articulated in Critique of Pure Reason (see 2f above). Where the Critique had shown the necessary conceptual forms to which all possible objects of experience must conform, the Metaphysical Foundations specifies in greater detail what exactly the physical constitution of these objects must be like. The continuity with the theory of experience from the Critique is implicit in the very structure of the Metaphysical Foundations. Just as Kant’s theory of experience was divided into four sections corresponding to the four groups of categories (quantity, quality, relation, modality), the body of the Metaphysical Foundations is also divided along the same lines.

Like the theory of the Physical Monadology, the Metaphysical Foundations presents a “dynamical” theory of matter according to which material substance is constituted by an interaction between attractive and repulsive forces. The basic idea is that each volume of material substance possesses a brute tendency to expand and push away other volumes of substance (this is repulsive force) and each volume of substance possesses a brute tendency to contract and to attract other volumes of substance (this is attractive force). The repulsive force explains the solidity and impenetrability of bodies while the attractive force explains gravitation (and presumably also phenomena such as magnetic attraction). Further, any given volume of substance will possess these forces to a determinate degree: the matter in a volume can be more or less repulsive and more or less attractive. The ratio of attractive and repulsive force in a substance will determine how dense the body is. In this respect, Kant’s theory marks a sharp break from those of his mechanist predecessors. (Mechanists believed that all physical phenomena could be explained by appeal to the sizes, shapes, and velocities of material bodies.) The Cartesians thought that there is no true difference in density and that the appearance of differences in density could be explained by appeal to porosity in the body. Similarly, the atomists thought that density could be explained by differences in the ratio of atoms to void in any given volume. Thus for both of these theories, any time there was a volume completely filled in with material substance (no pores, no void), there could only be one possible value for mass divided by volume. According to Kant’s theory, by contrast, two volumes of equal size could be completely filled in with matter and yet differ in their quantity of matter (their mass), and hence differ in their density (mass divided by volume). Another consequence of Kant’s theory that puts him at odds with the Cartesians and atomists was his claim that matter is elastic, hence compressible: a completely filled volume of matter could be reduced in volume while the quantity of matter remained unchanged (hence it would become denser). The Cartesians and atomists took this to be impossible.

At the end of his career, Kant worked on a project that was supposed to complete the connection between the transcendental philosophy and physics. Among other things, Kant attempted to give a transcendental, a priori demonstration of the existence of a ubiquitous “ether” that permeates all of space. Although Kant never completed a manuscript for this project (due primarily to the deterioration of his mental faculties at the end of his life), he did leave behind many notes and partial drafts. Many of these notes and drafts have been edited and published under the title Opus Postumum. 

b. Other Scientific Contributions

In addition to his major contributions to physics, Kant published various writings addressing different issues in the natural sciences. Early on he showed a great deal of interest in geology and earth science, as evidenced by the titles of some of his shorter essays: The question, Whether the Earth is Ageing, Considered from a Physical Point of View (1754); On the Causes of Earthquakes on the Occasion of the Calamity that Befell the Western Countries of Europe Towards the End of Last Year (1756); Continued Observations on the Earthquakes that Have been Experienced for Some Time (1756); New Notes to Explain the Theory of the Winds, in which, at the Same Time, He Invites Attendance to his Lectures (1756).

In 1755, he wrote the Succinct Exposition of Some Meditations on Fire (which he submitted to the university as a Master’s Thesis). There he argued, against the Cartesian mechanists, that physical phenomena such as fire can only be explained by appeal to elastic (that is, compressible) matter, which anticipated the mature physics of his Metaphysical Foundations (see 4a above).

One of Kant’s most lasting scientific contributions came from his early work in cosmology. In his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), Kant gave a mechanical explanation of the formation of the solar system and the galaxies in terms of the principles of Newtonian physics. (A shorter version of the argument also appears in The Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God from 1763.) Kant’s hypothesis was that a single mechanical process could explain why we observe an orbital motion of smaller bodies around larger ones at many different scales in the cosmos (moons around planets, planets around stars, and stars around the center of the galaxy). He proposed that at the beginning of creation, all matter was spread out more or less evenly and randomly in a kind of nebula. Since the various bits of matter all attracted each other through gravitation, bodies would move towards each other within local regions to form larger bodies. The largest of these became stars, and the smaller ones became moons or planets. Because everything was already in motion (due to the gravitational attraction of everything to everything), and because all objects would be pulled towards the center of mass of their local region (for example, the sun at the center of the solar system, or a planet at the center of its own smaller planetary system), the motion of objects within that region would become orbital motions (as described by Newton’s theory of gravity). Although the Universal Natural History was not widely read for most of Kant’s lifetime (due primarily to Kant’s publisher going bankrupt while the printed books remained in a warehouse), in 1796 Pierre-Simon Laplace (1749-1827) proposed a remarkably similar version of the same theory, and this caused renewed interest in Kant’s book. Today the theory is referred to as the “Kant-Laplace Nebular Hypothesis,” and a modified version of this theory is still held today.

Finally, in the second half of Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), Kant discusses the philosophical foundations of biology by way of an analysis of teleological judgments. While in no way a fully worked out biological theory per se, Kant connects his account of biological cognition in interesting ways to other important aspects of his philosophical system. First, natural organisms are essentially teleological, or “purposive.” This purposiveness is manifested through the organic structure of the organism: its many parts all work together to constitute the whole, and any one part only makes sense in terms of its relation to the healthy functioning of the whole. For instance, the teeth of an animal are designed to chew the kind of food that the animal is equipped to hunt or forage and that it is suited to digest. In this respect, biological entities bear a strong analogy to great works of art. Great works of art are also organic insofar as the parts only make sense in the context of the whole, and art displays a purposiveness similar to that found in nature (see section 7 below). Second, Kant discusses the importance of biology with respect to theological cognition. While he denies that the apparent design behind the purposiveness of organisms can be used as a proof for God’s existence (see 2g3 above), he does think that the purposiveness found in nature provides a sort of hint that there is an intelligible principle behind the observable, natural world, and hence that the ultimate purpose of all of nature is a rational one. In connection with his moral theory and theory of human history (see sections 5 and 6 below), Kant will argue that the teleology of nature can be understood as ultimately directed towards a culmination in a fully rational nature, that is, humanity in its (future) final form.

5. Moral Theory

Kant’s moral theory is organized around the idea that to act morally and to act in accordance with reason are one and the same. In virtue of being a rational agent (that is, in virtue of possessing practical reason, reason which is interested and goal-directed), one is obligated to follow the moral law that practical reason prescribes. To do otherwise is to act irrationally. Because Kant places his emphasis on the duty that comes with being a rational agent who is cognizant of the moral law, Kant’s theory is considered a form of deontology (deon- comes from the Greek for “duty” or “obligation”).

Like his theoretical philosophy, Kant’s practical philosophy is a priori, formal, and universal: the moral law is derived non-empirically from the very structure of practical reason itself (its form), and since all rational agents share the same practical reason, the moral law binds and obligates everyone equally. So what is this moral law that obligates all rational agents universally and a priori? The moral law is determined by what Kant refers to as the Categorical Imperative, which is the general principle that demands that one respect the humanity in oneself and in others, that one not make an exception for oneself when deliberating about how to act, and in general that one only act in accordance with rules that everyone could and should obey.

Although Kant insists that the moral law is equally binding for all rational agents, he also insists that the bindingness of the moral law is self-imposed: we autonomously prescribe the moral law to ourselves. Because Kant thinks that the kind of autonomy in question here is only possible under the presupposition of a transcendentally free basis of moral choice, the constraint that the moral law places on an agent is not only consistent with freedom of the will, it requires it. Hence, one of the most important aspects of Kant’s project is to show that we are justified in presupposing that our morally significant choices are grounded in a transcendental freedom (the very sort of freedom that Kant argued we could not prove through mere “theoretical” or “speculative” reason; see 2gii above).

This section aims to explain the structure and content of Kant’s moral theory (5a-b), and also Kant’s claims that belief in freedom, God, and the immortality of the soul are necessary “postulates” of practical reason (5c). (On the relation between Kant’s moral theory and his aesthetic theory, see 7c below.)

a. The Good Will and Duty

Kant lays out the case for his moral theory in Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), Critique of Practical Reason (also known as the “Second Critique”; 1788), and the Metaphysics of Morals (1797). His arguments from the Groundwork are his most well-known and influential, so the following focuses primarily on them.

Kant begins his argument from the premise that a moral theory must be grounded in an account of what is unconditionally good. If something is merely conditionally good, that is, if its goodness depends on something else, then that other thing will either be merely conditionally good as well, in which case its goodness depends on yet another thing, or it will be unconditionally good. All goodness, then, must ultimately be traceable to something that is unconditionally good. There are many things that we typically think of as good but that are not truly unconditionally good. Beneficial resources such as money or power are often good, but since these things can be used for evil purposes, their goodness is conditional on the use to which they are put. Strength of character is generally a good thing, but again, if someone uses a strong character to successfully carry out evil plans, then the strong character is not good. Even happiness, according to Kant, is not unconditionally good. Although all humans universally desire to be happy, if someone is happy but does not deserve their happiness (because, for instance, their happiness results from stealing from the elderly), then it is not good for the person to be happy. Happiness is only good on the condition that the happiness is deserved.

Kant argues that there is only one thing that can be considered unconditionally good: a good will. A person has a good will insofar as they form their intentions on the basis of a self-conscious respect for the moral law, that is, for the rules regarding what a rational agent ought to do, one’s duty. The value of a good will lies in the principles on the basis of which it forms its intentions; it does not lie in the consequences of the actions that the intentions lead to. This is true even if a good will never leads to any desirable consequences at all: “Even if… this will should wholly lack the capacity to carry out its purpose… then, like a jewel, it would still shine by itself, as something that has its full worth in itself” (4:393). This is in line with Kant’s emphasis on the unconditional goodness of a good will: if a will were evaluated in terms of its consequences, then the goodness of the will would depend on (that is, would be conditioned on) those consequences. (In this respect, Kant’s deontology is in stark opposition to consequentialist moral theories, which base their moral evaluations on the consequences of actions rather than the intentions behind them.)

b. The Categorical Imperative

If a good will is one that forms its intentions on the basis of correct principles of action, then we want to know what sort of principles these are. A principle that commands an action is called an “imperative.” Most imperatives are “hypothetical imperatives,” that is, they are commands that hold only if certain conditions are met. For instance: “if you want to be a successful shopkeeper, then cultivate a reputation for honesty.” Since hypothetical imperatives are conditioned on desires and the intended consequences of actions, they cannot serve as the principles that determine the intentions and volitions of an unconditionally good will. Instead, we require what Kant calls a “categorical imperative.” Where hypothetical imperatives take the form, “if y is desired/intended/sought, do x,” categorical imperatives simply take the form, “do x.” Since a categorical imperative is stripped of all reference to the consequences of an action, it is thereby stripped of all determinate content, and hence it is purely formal. And since it is unconditional, it holds universally. Hence a categorical imperative expresses only the very form of a universally binding law: “nothing is left but the conformity of actions as such with universal law” (4:402). To act morally, then, is to form one’s intentions on the basis of the very idea of a universal principle of action.

This conception of a categorical imperative leads Kant to his first official formulation of the categorical imperative itself: “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). A maxim is a general rule that can be used to determine particular courses of actions in particular circumstances. For instance, the maxim “I shall lie when it will get me out of trouble” can be used to determine the decision to lie about an adulterous liaison. The categorical imperative offers a decision procedure for determining whether a given course of action is in accordance with the moral law. After determining what maxim one would be basing the action in question on, one then asks whether it would be possible, given the power (in an imagined, hypothetical scenario), to choose that everyone act in accordance with that same maxim. If it is possible to will that everyone act according to that maxim, then the action under consideration is morally permissible. If it is not possible to will that everyone act according to that maxim, the action is morally impermissible. Lying to cover up adultery is thus immoral because one cannot will that everyone act according to the maxim, “I shall lie when it will get me out of trouble.” Note that it is not simply that it would be undesirable for everyone to act according to that maxim. Rather, it would be impossible. Since everyone would know that everyone else was acting according to that maxim, there would never be the presupposition that anyone was telling the truth; the very act of lying, of course, requires such a presupposition on the part of the one being lied to. Hence, the state of affairs where everyone lies to get out of trouble can never arise, so it cannot be willed to be a universal law. It fails the test of the categorical imperative.

The point of Kant’s appeal to the universal law formulation of the categorical imperative is to show that an action is morally permissible only if the maxim on which the action is based could be affirmed as a universal law that everyone obeys without exception. The mark of immorality, then, is that one makes an exception for oneself. That is, one acts in a way that they would not want everyone else to. When someone chooses to lie about an adulterous liaison, one is implicitly thinking, “in general people should tell the truth, but in this case I will be the exception to the rule.”

Kant’s first formulation of the categorical imperative describes it in terms of the very form of universal law itself. This formal account abstracts from any specific content that the moral law might have for living, breathing human beings. Kant offers a second formulation to address the material side of the moral law. Since the moral law has to do with actions, and all actions are by definition teleological (that is, goal-directed), a material formulation of the categorical imperative will require an appeal to the “ends” of human activity. Some ends are merely instrumental, that is, they are sought only because they serve as “means” towards further ends. Kant argues that the moral law must be aimed at an end that is not merely instrumental, but is rather an end in itself. Only rational agents, according to Kant, are ends in themselves. To act morally is thus to respect rational agents as ends in themselves. Accordingly, the categorical imperative can be reformulated as follows: “So act that you use humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means” (4:429). The basic idea here is that it is immoral to treat someone as a thing of merely instrumental value; persons have an intrinsic (non-instrumental) value, and the moral law demands that we respect this intrinsic value. To return to the example of the previous paragraphs, it would be wrong to lie about an adulterous liaison because by withholding the truth one is manipulating the other person to make things easier for oneself; this sort of manipulation, however, amounts to treating the other as a thing (as a mere means to the comfort of not getting in trouble), and not as a person deserving of respect and entitled to the truth.

The notion of a universal law provides the form of the categorical imperative and rational agents as ends in themselves provide the matter. These two sides of the categorical imperative are combined into yet a third formulation, which appeals to the notion of a “kingdom of ends.” A kingdom of ends can be thought of as a sort of perfectly just utopian ideal in which all citizens of this kingdom freely respect the intrinsic worth of the humanity in all others because of an autonomously self-imposed recognition of the bindingness of the universal moral law for all rational agents. The third formulation of the categorical imperative is simply the idea that one should act in whatever way a member of this perfectly just society would act: “act in accordance with the maxims of a member giving universal laws for a merely possible kingdom of ends” (4:439). The idea of a kingdom of ends is an ideal (hence the “merely possible”). Although humanity may never be able to achieve such a perfect state of utopian coexistence, we can at least strive to approximate this state to an ever greater degree.

c. Postulates of Practical Reason

In Critique of Pure Reason, Kant had argued that although we can acknowledge the bare logical possibility that humans possess free will, that there is an immortal soul, and that there is a God, he also argued that we can never have positive knowledge of these things (see 2g above). In his ethical writings, however, Kant complicates this story. He argues that despite the theoretical impossibility of knowledge of these objects, belief in them is nevertheless a precondition for moral action (and for practical cognition generally). Accordingly, freedom, immortality, and God are “postulates of practical reason.” (The following discussion draws primarily on Critique of Practical Reason.)

We will start with freedom. Kant argues that morality and the obligation that comes with it are only possible if humans have free will. This is because the universal laws prescribed by the categorical imperative presuppose autonomy (autos = self; nomos = law). To be autonomous is to be the free ground of one’s own principles, or “laws” of action. Kant argues that if we presuppose that humans are rational and have free will, then his entire moral theory follows directly. The problem, however, lies in justifying the belief that we are free. Kant had argued in the Second Analogy of Experience that every event in the natural world has a “determining ground,” that is, a cause, and so all human actions, as natural events, themselves have deterministic causes (see 2f above). The only room for freedom of the will would lie in the realm of things in themselves, which contains the noumenal correlate of my phenomenal self. Since things in themselves are unknowable, I can never look to them to get evidence that I possess transcendental freedom. Kant gives at least two arguments to justify belief in freedom as a precondition of his moral theory. (There is a great deal of controversy among commentators regarding the exact form of his arguments, as well as their success. It will not be possible to adjudicate those disputes in any detail here. See Section 10 (References and Further Readings) for references to some of these commentaries.)

In the Groundwork, Kant suggests that the presupposition that we are free follows as a consequence of the fact that we have practical reason and that we think of ourselves as practical agents. Any time I face a choice that requires deliberation, I must consider the options before me as really open. If I thought of my course of action as already determined ahead of time, then there would not really be any choice to make. Furthermore, in taking my deliberation to be real, I also think of the possible outcomes of my actions as caused by me. The notion of a causality that originates in the self is the notion of a free will. So the very fact that I do deliberate about what actions I will take means that I am presupposing that my choice is real and hence that I am free. As Kant puts it, all practical agents act “under the idea of freedom” (4:448). It is not obvious that this argument is strong enough for Kant’s purposes. The position seems to be that I must act as though I am free, but acting as though I am free in no way entails that I really am free. At best, it seems that since I act as though I am free, I thereby must act as though morality really does obligate me. This does not establish that the moral law really does obligate me.

In the Second Critique, Kant offers a different argument for the reality of freedom. He argues that it is a brute “fact of reason” (5:31) that the categorical imperative (and so morality generally) obligates us as rational agents. In other words, all rational agents are at least implicitly conscious of the bindingness of the moral law on us. Since morality requires freedom, it follows that if morality is real, then freedom must be real too. Thus this “fact of reason” allows for an inference to the reality of freedom. Although the conclusion of this argument is stronger than the earlier argument, its premise is more controversial. For instance, it is far from obvious that all rational agents are conscious of the moral law. If they were, how come no one discovered this exact moral law before 1785 when Kant wrote the Groundwork? Equally problematic, it is not clear why this “fact of reason” should count as knowledge of the bindingness of the moral law. It may just be that we cannot help but believe that the moral law obligates us, in which case we once again end up merely acting as though we are free and as though the moral law is real.

Again, there is much debate in the literature about the structure and success of Kant’s arguments. It is clear, however, that the success of Kant’s moral project stands or falls with his arguments for freedom of the will, and that the overall strength of this theory is determined to a high degree by the epistemic status of our belief in our own freedom.

Kant’s arguments for immortality and God as postulates of practical reason presuppose that the reality of the moral law and the freedom of the will have been established, and they also depend on the principle that “‘ought’ implies ‘can’”: one cannot be obligated to do something unless the thing in question is doable. For instance, there is no sense in which I am obligated to single-handedly solve global poverty, because it is not within my power to do so. According to Kant, the ultimate aim of a rational moral agent should be to become perfectly moral. We are obligated to strive to become ever more moral. Given the “ought implies can” principle, if we ought to work towards moral perfection, then moral perfection must be possible and we can become perfect. However, Kant holds that moral perfection is something that finite rational agents such as humans can only progress towards, but not actually attain in any finite amount of time, and certainly not within any one human lifetime. Thus the moral law demands an “endless progress” towards “complete conformity of the will with the moral law” (5:122). This endless progress towards perfection can only be demanded of us if our own existence is endless. In short, one’s belief that one should strive towards moral perfection presupposes the belief in the immortality of the soul.

In addition to the “ought implies can” principle, Kant’s argument about belief in God also involves an elaboration of the notion of the “highest good” at which all moral action aims (at least indirectly). According to Kant, the highest good, that is, the most perfect possible state for a community of rational agents, is not only one in which all agents act in complete conformity with the moral law. It is also a state in which these agents are happy. Kant had argued that although everyone naturally desires to be happy, happiness is only good when one deserves to be happy. In the ideal scenario of a morally perfect community of rational agents, everyone deserves to be happy. Since a deserved happiness is a good thing, the highest good will involve a situation in which everyone acts in complete conformity with the moral law and everyone is completely happy because they deserve to be. Now since we are obligated to work towards this highest good, this complete, universal, morally justified happiness must be possible (again, because “ought” implies “can”). This is where a puzzle arises. Although happiness is connected to morality at the conceptual level when one deserves happiness, there is no natural connection between morality and happiness. Our happiness depends on the natural world (for example, whether we are healthy, whether natural disasters affect us), and the natural world operates according to laws that are completely separate from the laws of morality. Accordingly, acting morally is in general no guarantee that nature will make it possible for one to be happy. If anything, behaving morally will often decrease one’s happiness (for doing the right thing often involves doing the uncomfortable, difficult thing). And we all have plenty of empirical evidence from the world we live in that often bad things happen to good people and good things happen to bad people. Thus if the highest good (in which happiness is proportioned to virtue) is possible, then somehow there must be a way for the laws of nature to eventually lead to a situation in which happiness is proportioned to virtue. (Note that since at this point in the argument, Kant takes himself to have established immortality as a postulate of practical reason, this “eventually” may very well be far in the future). Since the laws of nature and the laws of morality are completely separate on their own, the only way that the two could come together such that happiness ends up proportioned to virtue would be if the ultimate cause and ground of nature set up the world in such a way that the laws of nature would eventually lead to the perfect state in question. Therefore, the possibility of the highest good requires the presupposition that the cause of the world is intelligent and powerful enough to set nature up in the right way, and also that it wills in accordance with justice that eventually the laws of nature will indeed lead to a state in which the happiness of rational agents is proportioned to their virtue. This intelligent, powerful, and just cause of the world is what traditionally goes by the name of “God.” Hence God is a postulate of practical reason.

6. Political Theory and Theory of Human History

Kant’s ethical theory emphasized reason, autonomy, and a respect for the humanity of others. These central aspects of his theory of individual moral choice are carried over to his theories of humanity’s history and of ideal political organization. This section covers Kant’s teleological history of the human race (6a), the basic elements of his political theory (6b), and his theory of the possibility of world peace (6c).

a. Human History and the Age of Enlightenment

Kant’s socio-political philosophy must be understood in terms of his understanding of the history of humanity, of its teleology, and in terms of his particular time and place: Europe during the Enlightenment.

In his short essay “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose” (1784), Kant outlines a speculative sketch of humanity’s history organized around his conception of the teleology intrinsic to the species. The natural purpose of humanity is the development of reason. This development is not something that can take place in one individual lifetime, but is instead the ongoing project of humanity across the generations. Nature fosters this goal through both human physiology and human psychology. Humans have no fur, claws, or sharp teeth, and so if we are to be sheltered and fed, we must use our reason to create the tools necessary to satisfy our needs. More importantly, at the cultural level, Kant argues that human society is characterized by an “unsocial sociability”: on the one hand, humans need to live with other humans and we feel incomplete in isolation; but on the other, we frequently disagree with each other and are frustrated when others don’t agree with us on important matters. The frustration brought on by disagreement serves as an incentive to develop our capacity to reason so that we can argue persuasively and convince others to agree with us.

By means of our physiological deficiencies and our unsocial sociability, nature has nudged us, generation by generation, to develop our capacity for reason and slowly to emerge from the hazy fog of pre-history up to the present. This development is not yet complete. Kant takes stock of where we were in his day, in late 18th c. Prussia) in his short, popular essay: “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” (1784). To be enlightened, he argues, is to determine one’s beliefs and actions in accordance with the free use of one’s reason. The process of enlightenment is humanity’s “emergence from its self-incurred immaturity” (8:35), that is, the emergence from an uncritical reliance on the authority of others (for example, parents, monarchs, or priests). This is a slow, on-going process. Kant thought that his own age was an age of enlightenment, but not yet a fully enlightened age.

The goal of humanity is to reach a point where all interpersonal interactions are conducted in accordance with reason, and hence in accordance with the moral law (this is the idea of a kingdom of ends described in 5b above). Kant thinks that there are two significant conditions that must be in place before such an enlightened age can come to be. First, humans must live in a perfectly just society under a perfectly just constitution. Second, the nations of the world must coexist as an international federation in a state of “perpetual peace.” Some aspects of the first condition are discussed in 6b, and of the second in 6c.

b. Political Theory

Kant fullest articulation of his political theory appears in the “Doctrine of Right,” which is the first half of Metaphysics of Morals (1797). In line with his belief that a freedom grounded in rationality is what bestows dignity upon human beings, Kant organizes his theory of justice around the notion of freedom: “Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law, or if on its maxim the freedom of choice of each can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law” (6:230). Implicit in this definition is a theory of equality: everyone should be granted the same degree of freedom. Although a state, through the passing and enforcing of laws, necessarily restricts freedom to some degree, Kant argues that this is necessary for the preservation of equality of human freedom. This is because when the freedoms of all are unchecked (for example, in the state of nature, which is also a condition of anarchy), the strong will overpower the weak and infringe on their freedoms, in which case freedoms will not be distributed equally, contrary to Kant’s basic principle of right. Hence a fair and lawful coercion that restricts freedom is consistent with and required by maximal and equal degrees of freedom for all.

Kant holds that republicanism is the ideal form of government. In a republic, voters elect representatives and these representatives decide on particular laws on behalf of the people. (Kant shows that he was not free of the prejudices of his day, and claims, with little argument, that neither women nor the poor should be full citizens with voting rights.) Representatives are duty-bound to choose these laws from the perspective of the “general will” (a term Kant borrows from Rousseau), rather than from the perspective of the interests of any one individual or group within society. Even though the entire population does not vote on each individual law, a law is said to be just only in case an entire population of rational agents could and would consent to the law. In this respect, Kant’s theory of just law is analogous to his universal law formulation of the categorical imperative: both demand that it be possible in principle for everyone to affirm the rule in question (see 5b above).

Among the freedoms that ought to be respected in a just society (republican or otherwise) are the freedom to pursue happiness in any way one chooses (so long as this pursuit does not infringe the rights of others, of course), freedom of religion, and freedom of speech. These last two are especially important to Kant and he associated them with the ongoing enlightenment of humanity in “What is Enlightenment?” He argues that it “would be a crime against human nature” (8:39) to legislate religious doctrine because doing so would be to deny to humans the very free use of reason that makes them human. Similarly, restrictions on what Kant calls the “public use of one’s reason” are contrary to the most basic teleology of the human species, namely, the development of reason. Kant himself had felt the sting of an infringement on these rights when the government of Friedrich Wilhelm II (the successor to Frederick the Great) prohibited Kant from publishing anything further on matters pertaining to religion.

c. Perpetual Peace

Kant elaborates the cosmopolitan theory first proposed in “Idea for a Universal History” in his Towards Perpetual Peace (1795). The basic idea is that world peace can be achieved only when international relations mirror, in certain respects, the relations between individuals in a just society. Just as people cannot be traded as things, so too states cannot be traded as though they were mere property. Just as individuals must respect others’ rights to free self-determination, so too, “no state shall forcibly interfere in the constitution and government of another state” (8:346). And in general, just as individuals need to arrange themselves into just societies, states, considered as individuals themselves, must arrange themselves into a global federation, a “league of nations” (8:354). Of course, until a state of perpetual peace is reached, wars will be inevitable. Even in times of wars, however, certain laws must be respected. For instance, it is never permissible for hostilities to become so violent as to undermine the possibility of a future peace treaty.

Kant argued that republicanism is especially conducive to peace, and he argued that perpetual peace would require that all states be republics. This is because the people will only consent to a war if they are willing to bear the economic burdens that war brings, and such a cost will only be worthwhile when there is a truly dire threat. If only the will of the monarch is required to go to war, since the monarch will not have to bear the full burden of the war (the cost will be distributed among the subjects), there is much less disincentive against war.

According to Kant, war is the result of an imbalance or disequilibrium in international relations. Although wars are never desirable, they lead to new conditions in international relations, and sometimes these new conditions are more balanced than the previous ones. When they are more balanced, there is less chance of new war occurring. Overall then, although the progression is messy and violent along the way, the slow march towards perpetual peace is a process in which all the states of the world slowly work towards a condition of balance and equilibrium.

7. Theory of Art and Beauty

Kant’s most worked out presentation of his views on aesthetics appears in Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), also known as the “Third Critique.” As the title implies, Kant’s aesthetic theory is cashed out through an analysis of the operations of the faculty of judgment. That is, Kant explains what it is for something to be beautiful by explaining what goes into the judgment that something is beautiful. This section explains the structure of aesthetic judgments of the beautiful and the sublime (7a), summarizes Kant’s theory of art and the genius behind art (7b), and finally explains the connection between Kant’s aesthetic theory and his moral theory (7c).

a. The Beautiful and the Sublime

Kant holds that there are three different types of aesthetic judgments: judgments of the agreeable, of the beautiful, and of the sublime. The first is not particularly interesting, because it pertains simply to whatever objects happen to cause us (personally) pleasure or pain. There is nothing universal about such judgments. If one person finds botanical gin pleasant and another does not, there is no disagreement, simply different responses to the stimulus. Judgments of the beautiful and the sublime, however, are more interesting and worth spending some time on.

Let us consider judgments of beauty (which Kant calls “judgments of taste”) first. Kant argues that all judgments of taste involve four components, or “moments.” First, judgments of taste involve a subjective yet disinterested enjoyment. We have an appreciation for the object without desiring it. This contrasts judgments of taste from both cognitions, which represent objects as they are rather than how they affect us, and desires, which represent objects in terms of what we want. Second, judgments of taste involve universality. When we judge an object to be beautiful, implicit in the judgment is the belief that everyone should judge the object in the same way. Third, judgments of taste involve the form of purposiveness, or “purposeless purposiveness.” Beautiful objects seem to be “for” something, even though there is nothing determinate that they are for. Fourth, judgments of taste involve necessity. When presented with a beautiful object, I take it that I ought to judge it as beautiful. Taken together, the theory is this: when I judge something as beautiful, I enjoy the object without having any desires with respect to it, I believe that everyone should judge the object to be beautiful, I represent some kind of purposiveness in it, but without applying any concepts that would determine its specific purpose, and I also represent myself as being obligated to judge it to be beautiful. Judgments of beauty are thus quite peculiar. On the one hand, when we say an object is beautiful, it is not the same sort of predication as when I say something is green, is a horse, or fits in a breadbox. Yet it is not for that reason a purely subjective, personal judgment because of the necessity and intersubjective universality involved in such judgments.

A further remark is in order regarding the “form of purposiveness” in judgments of taste. Kant wants to emphasize that no determinate concepts are involved in judgments of taste, but that the “reflective” power of judgment (that is, judgment’s ability to seek to find a suitable concept to fit an object) is nevertheless very active during such judgments. When I encounter an unfamiliar object, my reflective judgment is set in motion and seeks a concept until I figure out what sort of thing the object is. When I encounter a beautiful object, the form of purposiveness in the object also sets my reflecting judgment in motion, but no determinate concept is ever found for the object. Although this might be expected to lead to frustration, Kant instead claims that it provokes a “free play” (5:217) between the imagination and understanding. Kant does not say as much about this “free play” as one would like, but the idea seems to be that since the experience is not constrained by a determinate concept that must be applied to the object, the imagination and understanding are free to give in to a lively interplay of thought and emotion in response to the object. The experience of this free play of the faculties is the part of the aesthetic experience that we take to be enjoyable.

Aside from judgments of taste, there is another important form of aesthetic experience: the experience of the sublime. According to Kant, the experience of the sublime occurs when we face things (whether natural or manmade) that dwarf the imagination and make us feel tiny and insignificant in comparison. When we face something so large that we cannot come up with a concept to adequately capture its magnitude, we experience a feeling akin to vertigo. A good example of this is the “Deep Field” photographs from the Hubble Telescope. We already have trouble comprehending the enormity of the Milky Way, but when we see an image containing thousands of other galaxies of approximately the same size, the mind cannot even hope to comprehend the immensity of what is depicted. Although this sort of experience can be disconcerting, Kant also says that a disinterested pleasure (similar to the pleasure in the beautiful) is experienced when the ideas of reason pertaining to the totality of the cosmos are brought into play. Although the understanding can have no empirical concept of such an indeterminable magnitude, reason has such an idea (in Kant’s technical sense of “idea”; see 2g above), namely, the idea of the world as an indefinitely large totality. This feeling that reason can subsume and capture even the totality of the immeasurable cosmos leads to the peculiar pleasure of the sublime.

b. Theory of Art

Both natural objects and manmade art can be judged to be beautiful. Kant suggests that natural beauties are purest, but works of art are especially interesting because they result from human genius. The following briefly summarizes Kant’s theory of art and genius.

Although art must be manmade and not natural, Kant holds that art is beautiful insofar as it imitates the beauty of nature. Specifically, a beautiful work of art must display the “form of purposiveness” (described above, 7a) that can be encountered in the natural world. What makes great art truly great, though, is that it is the result of genius in the artist. According to Kant, genius is the innate talent possessed by the exceptional, gifted individual that allows that individual to translate an intangible “aesthetic idea” into a tangible work of art. Aesthetic ideas are the counterparts to the ideas of reason (see 2g above): where ideas of reason are concepts for which no sensible intuition is adequate, aesthetic ideas are representations of the imagination for which no concept is adequate (this is in line with Kant’s claim that beauty is not determinately conceptualizable).  When a genius is successful at exhibiting an aesthetic idea in a beautiful work of art, the work will provoke the “free play” of the faculties described above (7a).

Kant divides the arts into three groups: the arts of speech (rhetoric and poetry), pictorial arts (sculpture, architecture, and painting), and the art of the play of sensations (music and “the art of colors”) (5:321ff.). These can, of course, be combined together. For instance opera combines music and poetry into song, and combines this with theatre (which Kant considers a form of painting). Kant deems poetry the greatest of the arts because of its ability to stimulate the imagination and understanding and expand the mind through reflection. Music is the most successful if judged in terms of “charm and movement of the mind” (5:328), because it evokes the affect and feeling of human speech, but without being constrained by the determinate concepts of actual words. However, if the question is which art advances culture the most, Kant thinks that painting is better than music.

One consequence of Kant’s theory of art is that the contemporary notion of “conceptual art” is a contradiction in terms: if there is a specific point or message (a determinate concept) that the artist is trying to get across, then the work cannot provoke the indeterminate free play that is necessary for the experience of the beautiful. At best, such works can be interesting or provocative, but not truly beautiful and hence not truly art.

c. Relation to Moral Theory

A final important aspect of Kant’s aesthetic theory is his claim that beauty is a “symbol” of morality (5:351ff.), and aesthetic judgment thereby functions as a sort of “propaedeutic” for moral cognition. This is because certain aspects of judgments of taste (see 7a above) are analogous in important respects to moral judgments. The immediacy and disinterestedness of aesthetic appreciation corresponds to the demand that moral virtue be praised even when it does not lead to tangibly beneficial consequences: it is good in itself. The free play of the faculties involved in appreciation of the beautiful reminds one of the freedom necessary for and presupposed by morality. And the universality and necessity involved in aesthetic judgments correspond to the universality and necessity of the moral law. In short, Kant holds that a cultivated sensitivity to aesthetic pleasures helps prepare the mind for moral cognition. Aesthetic appreciation makes one sensitive to the fact that there are pleasures beyond the merely agreeable just as there are goods beyond the merely instrumental.

8. Pragmatic Anthropology

Together with a course on “physical geography” (a study of the world), Kant taught a class on “pragmatic anthropology” almost every year of his career as a university teacher. Towards the end of his career, Kant allowed his collected lecture notes for his anthropology course to be edited and published as Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1789). Anthropology, for Kant, is simply the study of human nature. Pragmatic anthropology is useful, practical knowledge that students would need in order to successfully navigate the world and get through life.

The Anthropology is interesting in two very different ways. First, Kant presents detailed discussions of his views on issues related to empirical psychology, moral psychology, and aesthetic taste that fill out and give substance to the highly abstract presentations of his writings in pure theoretical philosophy. For instance, although in the theory of experience from Critique of Pure Reason Kant argues that we need sensory intuitions in order to have empirical cognition of the world, he does not explain in any detail how our specific senses—sight, hearing, touch, taste, smell—contribute to this cognition. The Anthropology fills in a lot of this story. For instance, we learn that sight and hearing are necessary for us to represent objects as public and intersubjectively available. And we learn that touch is necessary for us to represent objects as solid, and hence as substantial. With respect to his moral theory, many of Kant’s ethical writings can give the impression that emotions and sentiments can only work against morality, and that only pure reason can incline one towards the good. In the Anthropology Kant complicates this story, informing us that nature has implanted sentiments of compassion to incline us towards the good, even in the absence of a developed reason. Once reason has been developed, it can promote an “enthusiasm of good resolution” (7:254) through attention to concrete instances of virtuous action, in which case desire can work in cooperation with reason’s moral law, not against it. Kant also supplements his moral theory through pedagogical advice about how to cultivate an inclination towards moral behavior.

The other aspect of the Anthropology (and the student transcripts of his actual lectures) that makes it so interesting is that the wealth and range of examples and discussions gives a much fuller picture of Kant the person than we can get from his more technical writings. The many examples present a picture of a man with wide-ranging opinions on all aspects of the human experience. There are discussions of dreams, humor, boredom, personality-types, facial expressions, pride and greed, gender and race issues, and more. We even get some fashion advice: it is acceptable to wear yellow under a blue coat, but gaudy to wear blue under a yellow coat. There has been a great deal of renewed interest in Kant’s anthropological writings and many commentators have been appealing to these often neglected texts as a helpful resource that provides contextualization of Kant’s more widely studied theoretical output.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Literature

The best scholarly, English translations of Kant’s work are published by Cambridge University Press as the Cambridge Editions of the Works of Immanuel Kant. The following are from that collection and contain some of Kant’s most important and influential writings.

  • Critique of Pure Reason, trans. Paul Guyer and Allen Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Practical Philosophy, ed. Mary Gregor. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. (Contains most of Kant’s ethical writings, including Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, Critique of Practical Reason, and Metaphysics of Morals.)
  • Critique of the Power of Judgment, trans. Paul Guyer and Eric MatthewsCambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770, ed. David Walford. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. (Contains most of Kant’s “pre-critical” writings in theoretical philosophy.)
  • Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, eds. Henry Allison and Peter Heath. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002 (Contains Kant’s mature writings in theoretical philosophy, including Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics and Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science.)
  • History, Anthropology, and Education, eds. Günter Zöller and Robert Louden. . Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. (Contains, among other writings, Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View.)

b. Secondary Literature

  • Ernst Cassirer (Kant’s Life and Thought, tr. by James Haden. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1983 (originally written in 1916)) and Manfred Kuehn (Kant: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002) both offer intellectual biographies that situate the development of Kant’s thought within the context of his life and times.
  • For comprehensive discussions of the metaphysics and epistemology of Critique of Pure Reason, see Paul Guyer (Kant and the Claims of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987), Henry Allison (Kant’s Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, Second Edition. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004), and Graham Bird (The Revolutionary Kant: A Commentary on the Critique of Pure Reason. Chicago: Open Court Press, 2006).
  • For treatments of Kant’s ethical theory, see Allen Wood (Kant’s Ethical Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), Christine Korsgaard (Creating the Kingdom of Ends. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), and Onora O’Neill (Constructions of Reason: Explorations of Kant’s Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
  • For analyses of Kant’s aesthetic theory (as well as other issues from the Third Critique), see Rachel Zuckert (Kant on Beauty and Biology: An Interpretation of the ‘Critique of Judgment’. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010), Paul Guyer (Kant and the Claims of Taste. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), and Henry Allison (Kant’s Theory of Taste: A Reading of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).
  • For studies of Kant’s anthropology and theory of human nature, see Patrick Frierson (What is the Human Being? London: Routledge, 2013) and Alix Cohen (Kant and the Human Sciences: Biology, Anthropology and History. London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2009).

 

Author Information

Tim Jankowiak
Email: timjankowiak@gmail.com
Towson University
U. S. A.

Roy Wood Sellars (1880—1973)

sellars

from The Papers of Roy Wood Sellars; used by permission of the Bentley Historical Library at the University of Michigan

Roy Wood Sellars was one of a generation of systematic philosophers in America the likes of which has not been seen before or since. He was born in Seaforth, Ontario in Canada, and spent most of his career at the University of Michigan where he continued working well into his 90s.  He was a fiercely independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to follow his own instincts.  He believed that the philosopher should be well-grounded both in the history of philosophy and in the sciences, and that the philosopher should engage philosophically with the major moral, social, and political issues of the day. His central aims were to combine and harmonize the insights of science and common sense, to update religion with the scientific advances of the day, and to promote a science-grounded system of progressive humanistic values. Over the course of his long life, Sellars wrote and published prolifically. He is the author of 15 books, over 100 articles, 14 book reviews and several miscellaneous works. He is best known for his pioneering formulations of critical realism (roughly, the view that, first, human beings normally perceive independent objects with their sensations but do not perceive sensations, and, second, human beings must interpret their sensations), evolutionary naturalism (a naturalistic version of emergent evolution), the “double knowledge” and mind-brain identity theory (the view that human beings possess two modes of knowledge of a single material reality), and a defence of religious humanism (the view that religion must be reinterpreted in terms of its role in improving humanity’s “this-worldly” existence).  He is the primary author of the Humanist Manifesto I of 1933.  Finally, he is the father of Wilfrid Sellars, a highly influential philosopher in his own right, many of whose views, allowing for the different vernacular and emphasis of the two periods, are continuous with his father’s views.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critical Realism
  3. Evolutionary Naturalism
  4. Organicism
  5. Value Theory
  6. Socialism
  7. The Humanist Manifesto
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Roy Wood Sellars (July 9, 1880-Sept. 5, 1973), was born in Seaforth, Ontario, the second son of Ford Wylis and Mary Stalker Sellars. (Warren 2007, 211 lists Sellars’ birth year as 1883, but this is an aberration. Most sources, including Warren elsewhere, all give the 1880 date. See Warren 1970, xi-xxv; 1973, 19-22; 1975, Ch. 1; Frankena 1973-74.) His ancestors had migrated from the Glasgow region in Scotland to Nova Scotia and later moved to Ontario.  In Ontario, the Sellars’ clan married into the prestigious Wood family, which included a distinguished Captain from the War of 1812 (David Wood) and the acting commissioner of the North West Mounted Police and Commissioner of the Canadian Yukon Territory (Zachary Taylor Wood).  This made him a relative to the 12th president of the United States (Zachary Taylor).  Sellars also took great pride in the fact that one of his ancestors, Lord Stanley, appears in Bosworth Field in Shakespeare’s Richard III.

Roy’s father, Ford, had been a schoolteacher and a school principal until health considerations forced him to abandon that profession.  Thereafter, Ford studied at the Medical School at the University of Michigan and became a physician in 1882. After graduating from medical school, the Sellars family settled in Pinnebog, Michigan. As this was a small town, Roy’s youthful companions were farm boys. In his youth, Roy pursued swimming, baseball, and hockey, and retained an interest in sports all his life.  His father’s library was the only one in the neighbourhood, and though young Roy knew little about philosophy, he read Emerson and Carlyle and had numerous discussions with his father about medicine. In this small rural community, Roy’s intellectual gifts quickly set him apart and he was sent to the Ferris Institute in Big Rapids, Michigan to prepare for a university career.

Roy entered the University of Michigan in 1899, where he did his own cooking and washed dishes for his lodgings.  Due to his small-town, rural background, the insecure young boy felt unprepared for a university program but he resolved to “make a go of it” and, upon his graduation, was voted one of the top two scholars in the class.  He studied widely in both the arts and the sciences, including rhetoric and calculus.  Sellars received his B.A. in 1903 from the University of Michigan and went on to Hartford Theological Seminary, where he studied New Testament Greek, Hebrew, and Arabic (and read the Koran in the original). He acquired a critical historically and culturally grounded approach to religion and a sympathy for social liberalism and humanism that remained with him throughout his life. In 1904 Professor R.M. Wenley of the Department of Philosophy at Michigan recommended Sellars for a fellowship at the University of Wisconsin, where he studied for a time before returning to the University of Michigan as Professor Wenley’s replacement while the latter was on sabbatical leave. Apart from a brief stint at University of Chicago in the summer of 1906 and a year studying in Europe (either 1908-09 or 1909-10 – sources differ on this), Sellars remained at the University of Michigan for the remainder of his approximately 40-year career, first as an instructor and doctoral student (he earned the Ph.D. in 1908 or 09 – again, sources differ), and then as a member of the permanent faculty.

During his year in Europe Sellars studied at the Sorbonne and discussed the possibility of a naturalistic formulation of emergent evolution with Henri Bergson. Bergson in turn referred him to the scientist and vitalist Hans Driesch. Sellars went on to study with Driesch and the neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband at Heidelberg. The precise details of Driesch’s influence on Sellars are not known but it seems likely that he directed Sellars to the study of physiology.  After returning to Michigan from his European adventures, Sellars developed a new course in the philosophy of science in which he used James Ward’s Naturalism and Agnosticism, as well as texts by Huxley, Mach, Poincaré, and Pearson.  Many of his students at this time came from the physical and biological sciences. Sellars remained scientifically-oriented throughout his life, a trait which he passed to his son Wilfrid. Even when Sellars was inspired by Bergson’s romantic or mystical theory of creative evolution, he sought (much like Popper) to recast it in more “naturalistic” terms acceptable to the sciences. Sellars’ naturalistic bent put him at odds with his most ardent supporter, Professor Wenley. Although Wenley regarded him as his best student, he could not accept Sellars’ naturalism, and did not approve of the publication of Sellars’ thesis by the University.

Sellars enjoyed considerable teaching success. His course, “The Principles and Problems of Philosophy,” was favorably remembered by many alumni who found it a “liberating” experience, “like taking a cold bath” (Frankena, 1973-74, 230).Several of the students in his political philosophy course, in which he discussed democracy, communism, socialism, and fascism, remarked that though they had expected him to be a propagandist, the course turned out to be a good scholarly treatment of the issues with no discernible bias.  Sellars had earlier taught a course in elementary logic and eventually published a textbook based on that course.  It was a chance reading of that textbook by Charles Stevenson that led him to the study of philosophy and later become one of Sellars’ colleagues (Frankena, 1973-74, 230).

Sellars married his cousin Helen Maud Stalker, an intelligent and accomplished woman, in 1911.  He wrote the Preface to Helen’s translation (from the French) of Celestine Bougle’s Evolution of Values.  Helen provided Sellars with much support and they remained close until her death in 1962.  In 1912 and 1913, respectively, their two children, Wilfrid and Cecily, were born. Cecily become a state-employed psychologist in North Dakota, but was killed in an automobile accident in 1954, an event which impacted Sellars’ scholarly work for decades. Twenty years later, well into his 90’s, he was still working on papers that had been in progress at the time of her death.  Wilfrid Sellars went on to become a highly influential philosopher in the latter half of the 20th century who, like his father, emphasized a firm grounding in the history of philosophy, fluency in the sciences, and a systematic approach to philosophical problems. It is noteworthy that his son Wilfrid developed a sophisticated version of scientific realism that builds on his father’s critical realism. In fact, Wilfrid’s views are often similar in substance to his father’s even if they differ in language and style.

Sellars believed in a fruitful, reciprocal relationship between epistemology and ontology, but saw epistemology as philosophically basic.  His most vehement criticism of other philosophers was often that they were weak in epistemology, but he also considered himself a proud ontologist.  Sellars also had a strong interest in ethics, social philosophy, and political philosophy.  Indeed, Sellars belongedto a genre of philosophers, which includes his son Wilfrid, that is rare today, who believed that a philosopher must be knowledgeable in virtually all areas of philosophy. Sellars made contributions to epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, the philosophy of science, social and political philosophy, and the history of philosophy. He could discourse in an intelligent and informed a way about Heidegger, Sartre, and Bergson just as he could about Russell, Carnap, or Einstein.  He was as at home in a discussion about ethics or social and political philosophy as he was in logic or scientific method.

Sellars was an independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to pursue his own philosophical direction.He formulated what may have been the most viable form of realism in his era. He offered a course, titled “Main Concepts of Science,” that may have been the very first course offered anywhere in the philosophy of science.  He formulated evolutionary naturalism, the view that life and mind are emergent products of naturalistically conceived evolution (i.e., without invoking the supernatural element in Alexander or Bergson’s élan vital). He (1923b; 1938a) pioneered the identity theory of the “brain-mind,” which he called the “double knowledge emergence approach” to mind-brain identity.  Although his basic views changed little over his career, he was constantly reformulating, developing, and clarifying them.  In his later years he watched as many of his views became commonplace, without being recognized for his role in their genesis.  

Perhaps because of his fierce independence, Sellars often found himself out of the mainstream. Until 1930, philosophy was dominated by idealism and pragmatism, religion by theism, and social theory by capitalism, while Sellars was a realist, an atheist, and a socialist. Later, analytical philosophy came into dominance and fundamentalism resurged in religion, neither of which appealed to him. Socialism did eventually enjoy a resurgence, but it was Marxist and totalitarian while Sellars was committed to a more moderate and gradual reform of social institutions based on rational persuasion.  Sellars was also critical of the American philosophy in his day. He (1970a, vii; see also Warren, 1975, 28) once remarked that, amongst philosophers, it is “almost always a Sellars against the world”. He often felt that he was better understood by psychologists and biologists than by philosophers and that he was better understood in Europe than in America (Warren 1975, 25).

Nonetheless, Sellars was a respected member of the philosophical community in America and it is safe to say that he inspired a personal affection from many of his colleagues that is unusual. He served as Vice-President of the Eastern Division of the APA in 1918 and President of the Western Division in 1923. He was an energetic correspondent and carried on friendly discussions with Samuel Alexander, C. Judson Herrick, Lloyd Morgan, and Marvin Farber. He also corresponded with F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, C.A. Strong, and Donald Williams, and he debated with D.C. Macintosh, H.N. Wieman, and Sydney Hook.  In 1954 the journal Philosophy and Phenomenological Research devoted an entire issue to Sellars’ philosophy, and in 1964 Andrew Reck listed Sellars as one of the 10 most notable philosophers in recent American philosophy. At the University of Michigan the Roy Wood Sellars Chair was created in his honor and Bucknell University honored him by establishing the Roy Wood Sellars Lecture Series. The first Roy Wood Sellars Lectures were given by Warren and the second by Wilfrid Sellars with Roy Sellars in attendance. In 1970 Notre Dame University honored Roy in his 90th year with a symposium on his philosophy, including presentations by Andrew Reck, Wilfrid Sellars, and C.F. Delany.  Although Roybelonged to a generation of America’s greatest systematic philosophers, Frankena (1973-4, 231) observes that, with hindsight, Sellars may have been one of the most important of them.  However, the fact that his son Wilfrid has developed a powerful formulation of his father’s views may be the greatest testament to Roy Wood Sellars’ lasting achievement.

2. Critical Realism

Much of Sellars’ philosophical work is an attempt to replace outdated mythopoetical views about knowledge, religion, values, and so forth, by up-to-date scientifically grounded views.  Science, he holds, “builds” on common sense, but since it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, the philosopher’s job is to harmonize the common sense and scientific frameworks (1932a, v; 1973, 160-161).

In his first book, Critical Realism , he attempts to justify common sense realism, which is also the view of philosophers when they are not in a reflective mood (1916a, 6)—the view that people perceive real external objects, not just intermediaries of some kind. He also aims to clarify the relation of common sense realism to scientific knowledge: “We start from independent things; and not from percepts” (1916a, 3).  Sellars also argues against the main theories of perception of his day: idealism, representationalism, pragmatism, and positivism, all of which he saw as undermining common sense realism. Other versions of critical realism were espoused by Santanaya and Lovejoy.

The defence of common sense realism, he (1941b; 1959c) holds, requires a robust defence of the correspondence theory of truth.The basic error in those mistaken views of perception is the failure to distinguish between the content and object of perception (1922a, 70 n 4).  Since the content of perception is fixed by aspects of the organism, those mistaken theories wrongly infer that the object of perception is not independent of the perceiver.

Sellars’ critical realism requires real substances (as opposed to ideas, universals, impressions, and so forth) as objects of perception. He (1929c; 1970a, 32; 1973, 182, 346-348, 353) rejects “the historical desiccation of the category of substance,” that is, the whittling down of the Ancient and Medieval robust notion of substance to Locke’s “I know not what”. While representationalism, idealism, pragmatism, and positivism tend to volatize the object of perception into ideas, sensations, or a mere placeholder for properties, Sellars holds the normal objects of perception are real full-bodied independent substances.

Although Sellars’ critical (or “referential”) realism is “built up from” common-sense realism, it is not identical with common sense since the latter has not faced the problems arising from discrepancies in perception (See his 1922c; 1924b; 1927b; 1927c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1959b; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1970, 6-8, 13, 15-16, 17-27, 33-35, 161; see also Warren, 1975, 35, 37). Despite his defense of common sense realism,Sellars rejects the “naïve realism” that identifies the immediate datum of knowledge with objects in the world. He distinguishes between the common sense realism of the ordinary person and the crude philosophical understanding embodied in naïve realism, the view that in perception one actually “intuits” the object (1963; see also Warren, 1975, 36-7).  In opposition to that naïve view, he holds that in perception one interprets one’s sensations. The interpretation of sensations is not a purely intellectual process: “A gull does not in the Lockean way apprehend his sensation …. [It] looks through his sensation at the fish in the water. It is a one-step sensi-motor process” (See his 1970a, 118; 1973, 49-50, 161; 1975; and Warren, 1975, 38-45!).

Sellars holds that the biological basis of knowledge consists in the organism’s adjustment to its external environment, where both the internal adjustment of the organism and external factors must be taken into account.  He sees his version of critical realism as a “mediate realism” that attempts to do justice both to the contribution of the perceiving organism and the claims of objective knowledge. That is, he aims to do justice to both the real and the “ideal” sides of cognition. It is absolutely crucial, he (1922a, 76-77) stresses, to distinguish between the causal conditions of perception and the referential act of perceiving. Perception is the interpretation of sense mediated by factors both internal and external to the perceiving subject. These internal factors are not to be confused with the mechanism or processes that underlie perception (that is, the account of the internal mechanism or processes is not an account of the content of perception). By taking account of both the internal and external factors, he seeks to avoid the evils of both naïve realism and the non-realist view that the objects of perception are not independent of mind.

The attempt of simultaneous justice to both  the subjective contribution of the organism and  the claims of objective knowledge is no easy matter. Various critical realists could not always agree how best to formulate the view (See Ramsperger, 1967). For example, Sellars (1970a, 5) rejects the sort of critical realism espoused by Santayana that erects a barrier of essences between the perceiver and the external object. Perhaps his basic point is that human beings perceive independent objects with their sensations, but do not perceive sensations, essences, or other mental or ideal intermediaries themselves (Warren, 1975, 38, 42). Sellars (1970a, 114-5) stresses that the fact that the object is present to consciousness does not mean that it must be present within consciousness.

Although Sellars’ sometimes wrote as if his version of critical realism is definitive,few agree that it is unproblematic. Since he acknowledges the subjective contribution of the perceiver, it can resemble representationalism. Since, however, he emphasizes that perception is a direct perception of independent objects, it can resembles naïve realism. Sellars counters that critical realism is the view that human knowing is a direct knowledge of objects, but that this knowledge is mediated by “logical ideas” (See his 1970a, 113 and the “Epilogue on Berkeley” in his 1968).  The problem is that it is hard to see how knowledge can be both mediated and direct. The claim that one perceives independent objects via one’s sensations but does not perceive those sensations themselves is a fair negative point, but seems to require a more robust positive account of the precise role of sensations in the perception of external objects. Sellars’ version of critical realism is intriguing, but many feel it requires further clarification (Chisholm 1955; Herbert, 1994; Wright, 1994; Levine, 2007).  Perhaps this is why Sellars continued to return to the issue again and again over the decades (See his 1929a; 1929b; 1929c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1950a; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1965; 1969d, Ch’s 4-5; 1970a, 112-131; and so forth).

3. Evolutionary Naturalism

Sellars does not have a fully developed philosophy of science, this being more characteristic of his son’s generation, but he does have definite views about scientific method and about the close relation of science to philosophy, some of which do anticipate his son’s views.  Sellars’ conception of science and its relation to philosophy is intimately related to his own views of evolutionary naturalism.

In Sellars’ (1973, 160-1) view, science “builds” on common sense, but it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, and so forth. He rejects the monochrome Newtonian universe in favor of an evolution-generated hierarchy of different levels of emergent causality: Under certain favorable conditions, life emerges from matter and mind from life (See his 1920c; 1922a, Ch. IX; 1924a; 1927a; 1933a; 1944b; 1959a; 1932, 4; 1969d, 64-68; and 1973, 290).  He is committed to the emergence of downward causal forces. That is, while the emergence of higher-order entities is causally dependent upon lower-order entities (bottom-up causation), once they emerge, the former may causally influence the latter (top-down causation) in ways not reducible to bottom-up causation (see Roy’s 1970, 38, 44-46 and Meehl and Sellars 1956). Sellars insists that the higher emergent entities are still material systems.

Although he does not deny the possibility of reductions in special cases, his conception of science is generally anti-reductionist (1922a, 16, 332; 1970, 136, 141, 240-1; Warren, 1975, 29).This explains why he holds that the scientific method cannot be identified with that of any particular science, such as physics (Warren, 1975, 29). When he (1932a, 5) describes his own view as physicalism, he does not mean physicalism in the more familiar sense but a view that accepts his own critical realism and emergence. Each of the sciences; natural, psychological, and social, treats of a particular domain in the emergent hierarchy, but none is privileged over the others.

The commitment to real independent substances in his critical realism dovetails with his evolutionary naturalism. The different levels in the emergent hierarchy are not just of events or properties, but of substances (1922a, Ch. XIII; 1932a, Ch. XII; 1943c; 1959a; 1970, 215).  Though the higher emergent levels are not reducible to material mechanisms, they do not introduce new non-natural forces. Life and mind are not non-natural forces entering nature from outside, but emergent capacities of natural substances (See his 1917b, 276-283; 1922a, vii-ix, 277-278, 333-336; 1933a; 1950b). See Emmet (1932, 222-23) for Whitehead’s very different Platonistic view)!

Sellars tends not to employ the classical formulation of emergence, that certain wholes are “greater than the sum of their parts”.  He (1922a, 302) does, however, use such formulations occasionally. See also his remarks on the relations of wholes and parts (1917a, 31, 145, 288). Since he talks of new unitary substantial wholes, talk of separable “parts” may be seen as misleading.Wilfrid Sellars (1949) clarifies his father’s somewhat obscure views. In general, however, in language reminiscent of Bergson but understood naturalistically, Sellars (1922a, viii, 17, 139, 167, 214-215, 297, 303, 322, 335, and so forth; 1932a, 3, 401; Blitz 2010) holds that modern science is beginning to accept the notion of “creative synthesis”, the view that change sometimes involves “the genesis of what Locke called ‘real essences’”.For a discussion of the classical part-whole formulations of emergence see McDonough (2002).

Agential causality, which is central to Sellars’ ethics, is underwritten by his evolutionary naturalism (1970a, 262-267). Agential causality emerges at a certain level of evolution and organization (1970a, viii; 1973a, Ch. 15). Human beings possess no “pushbutton free will,” but rather, an emergent capacity of the human brain is able to develop new judgments and standards that make a causal difference in behaviour (1932a, 396, 405; 1957a; 1959a; 1970a, 305; 1973a, 290-1, 361-384). He called his view “critical anthropomorphism” (1917b, 278).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism colors his view of the relation between science and philosophy. The diversity of the various irreducible levels in the emergent hierarchy requires a diversity of distinct autonomous sciences: physics, chemistry, biology, and so forth.  This yields problems with which none of the special sciences are prepared to deal.  The physicist can describe the behaviour of subatomic particles, but, qua physicist, is unfamiliar with the regularities and properties at higher levels in the emergent hierarchy. Similar points, in reverse, can be made about the biologist (psychologist, sociologist, and so forth), who are familiar with the objects at their higher levels of the hierarchy, but qua biologist, psychologist, sociologist, and so forth, are unfamiliar with the laws and properties at the lower levels.  Since, however, the evolutionary naturalist holds that the different levels in the emergent hierarchy constitute autonomous regions that fall outside any of the particular sciences, and since the items at different levels of the emergent hierarchy are linked in interesting ways that cannot be captured by reductions of one level to another, knowledge of the interrelations between these levels requires a different sort of knowledge, not possessed by any of the special sciences.

It is the distinctive job of the philosopher to obtain an overview of the relations between the different sciences, and between the sciences and the common sense framework, harmonize the new levels in the emergent hierarchy with each other and with the more stable and fixed background of inorganic nature (1922a, 263, 329; 1932a, 44ff, 79ff, 92ff).  Thus, philosophy completes science. “The job of philosophy is to size up the whole situation; and it often needs new leads” (1973, 161).One can see here the general outlines of his son’s (1991, 2, 18-19, 34, and so forth) view, that the distinctive job of philosophy is to obtain a synoptic view of the way things hang together, in the broadest sense.

Sellars published Evolutionary Naturalism in 1922, a year before both Morgan’s Emergent Evolution and Alexander’s “Natural Piety” (Warren, 1970, vi), although the latter two came to be better known for the formulation of emergent evolution. Warren (1973b) remarks that Morgan told Sellars that to his knowledge, Sellars was the first to publish on emergent evolution.  Bergson’s Creative Evolution, first published in 1907, does precede Sellars’ publications, but it differs in that it posits the non-scientific élan vital. Sellars saw his position as more systematic, empirical, and naturalistic than Bergson’s and Morgan’s since it does not introduce any non-natural controlling factors. Although Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism fell out of favor as reductionism gained ground, emergentism has once again arisen as a viable position in science, philosophy and religion (Beckermann, Kim, and Flores 1992; Hasker 2001; McDonough 2002; Davies and Clayton 2008, Blitz 2010; Vintiadis, and so forth).

4. Organicism

Although Sellars (1991, 415, 433) states that no other writer in recent times had challenged him as much, he claims that his own view deserves the title “philosophy of organism” more than Whitehead’s.  This is because Sellars sees living organisms as substantial wholes, whereas Whitehead sees them as a societies or nexuses of more fundamental entities. Sellars (1922a, vii-ix, 164-168) sees an organism as a product of emergent evolution in which simpler materials at a lower level are organized into new integrated substances with new causal powers at higher levels in the hierarchy. This higher-order substance is a true unity and not, as for Whitehead, a plurality (see Roy’s 1961b).

The living organism is, for Sellars, the background against which consciousness must be understood (1922a, 63, 298; 1932a, 446-7; 1949b, 95, 99). This leads him (1991, 415; 1970, 205) to agree with contemporaneous developments in physics, chemistry, biology, and psychology that emphasize fields and Gestalten, both of which are wholes that are not reducible to more fundamental entities.  Even so, the focus on the important organismic background should not lead one to confuse knowledge of the object with knowledge about the organism (1922a, 186-187). For similar reasons, he does not see a person as a combination of two separable substances as in Cartesian Dualism. He (1991, 415) describes his own position, which rejects the vitalistic and non-evolutionary elements in classical Aristotelianism, as an “Aristotelianism of the Left”. The same considerations lead him (1932a, 14-15; 1961b; 1973, 354-56; 1991, 416-7) to oppose the “reformed subjectivism” which he saw as the source both of the Platonism and rejection of naturalism and humanism in Whitehead’s philosophy of organism.

5. Value Theory

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism make values “centripetal” to human life and supports a humanistic theory of ethics and religion (1932a, 448; 1948b; 1949b, 78; 973, Ch. 14), all of which he counts as a virtue  He holds that human freedom emerges at a certain level or organization of organic development and lends a dignity and meaning to human life that is absent in a purely mechanical cosmos (1957a; 1949b, 103-4; 1970, 319-331).  Whereas the “old materialism” had been criticized as being unable to accommodate higher values, Sellars sees it as a virtue of his “new materialism” that it “flowers into humanism” (See also his 1932a, 19; 1944b; 1950b, 427-428). The emergence of living organisms from inorganic nature is a necessary condition for the existence of a world of values (1932a, 446-7).  It is people and human institutions that form the “hot center” of conscious life, while the inorganic world forms the “periphery and yet absolute condition for the whole drama” (1932a, 450).

Sellars is generally averse to ontological dualisms (1916a, 204, 245; 1922, 3091973a, Ch. 14; see also Sellars, McGill, and Farber, 1949) and holds they have done particular damage in value theory (see Roy’s 1917b, Ch. XVI; 1918, Ch. XII and Ch. XVI; 1921a; 1950b; Warren, 1975, 27, 41-2).  In general, he holds that each side in value-dualisms captures some fragment of the truth, but in their pure forms such dualisms are incapable of yielding a coherent theory of value.  Whereas some theories emphasize the objective basis, and others the subjective basis, for values, Sellars’ aims to do justice both “to the possibilities in the object and in the subject,” while taking “as objective a view of value as possible” (1932a, 445, 475; 1969d, Ch. 12). He sees this as an area where compromise and balance are essential. Value judgments are similar to cognitive judgments in some ways, but different in others. One can make mistakes in value judgments just as in cognitive judgments, but physical science does not discover values as properties of objects (1932a, 445; 1973, 344).  Rather, values are an interpretation of objects as having the capacity to affect human life in ways important to an individual or group (1932a, 445, 459-473; Warren 1975, 40).

In cognitive judgments, human beings regard themselves as disclosing the object itself, while in value judgments human beings are estimating the object with respect to its bearing on human life (1932a, 46).When the subjectivist claims that values are based on feelings, Sellars agrees, but holds that these subjective feelings are directed towards facts that can be objectively criticized. When the objectivist claims that values are based on objective facts, Sellars agrees, but holds that these facts only have value when “estimated with respect to human living” (1932a, 444). In valuing we are constrained by objective factors just as in perceiving, but we are also “interpreting” the object in the light of factors which are taken to be intimately linked to the self (1932a, 471; 1970, 244, 253, and so forth). It is important to acknowledge that Sellars (1922a, 29-30, 194-5, 312; and see and Wood, 1950, 525) does see the need for a kind of dualism in epistemology.

Sellars subjects “absolutism” and “factualism” about values to similar criticisms.  He (1932a, 457-459) rejects belief in absolute or intrinsic values since “a good which is not good for someone strikes me as meaningless”.  He (1932a, 16ff) describes “Eleatic views” that deny the significance of everyday beliefs as versions of “illusionism”. Similarly, when the “factualist” attempts to reduce values to some fact about human beings or human groups, for example, the fact that human beings prefer certain things and not others, Sellars (1932a, 452-3; 1970a, 245) replies that people are not like stones with only one possible reaction.  That is, alluding to his critique of “naïve realism”, these various “facts” are always really only some naïve immediate value (1932a,452). Even if some authority, for example, a church or an anthropologist, holds X is good, it is always possible to criticize that naïve immediate valuation by estimating its effect on human life. No authority, neither religious nor “scientific”, is immune to criticism.

Sellars (1932a, 446-7) stresses that “the background” to judgments of value is the emergent level of living organisms presupposed by the existence of value.Since an organism emerges from inorganic nature in the evolutionary process, his evolutionary naturalism is an essential part of his account of the genesis of the complex subject-object situations required for the existence of value (1922a, Ch. XV; 1932a, 68, 442; 1970a, 248-9, 267). Referring to his “open ended” emergent evolutionism (1970a, 267), he states that his “metaphysics of ethics in many ways represents its culmination” and that any attempt to explain the existence of value by reference to mere lifeless nature cannot succeed (1973, 359-60).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism is not just another version of materialism, but is enriched by his belief in the evolution of an emergent hierarchy containing the higher levels organisms and persons (1950b, 420, 422-6; 1970a, 154-173).  His naturalism “does not,” as some older versions of materialism, focused only on the physical sciences, did, “ignore the specialized areas of human living, morals, art, politics” (1932a, 449). Because man is “not just a knower but an agent” and a “desirer of good things”, the philosopher, in order to avoid an overly narrow conception of the human situation, must turn to the poets for a sense of “creative agency and decision” (1932a, 449).

6. Socialism

In The Next Step in Democracy (1916b) Sellars defends his own version of socialism (See also his 1970a, 272-73, 277-79, 289, 311, 334). Sellars distinguishes three stages of socialism: (1) the Utopian socialism of Fourier and Saint-Simon, (2) the “political socialism” that began with Marx’s Communist Manifesto, and (3) the later modification of Marx’s socialism based on an updated understanding of how society and people really work (1944-45b; 1970a, 272). The political socialism of Marx is called “scientific socialism” by its admirers, “orthodox socialism” by its critics (1970a, 279ff).

Sellars also rejects Utopian socialism as naïve and romantic, having little understanding of the obstacles to the creation of a genuine socialist society (1970a, 81). In contrast to the Utopian socialists, Sellars promotes a gradual modification of existing institutions in the light of new scientific advances with a full awareness that any “reckless unsettling” of the social foundations leads to disaster (1970a, 280, 292-293).  Sellars rejected the program to overthrow tradition on the basis of naïve romantic dreams of wishful thinking.

Although Sellars (1970a, 28-287) sees Marx as a fairly realistic and concrete “sort”, he holds that Marx was misled by revolutionary ardour into seeing history as a constant war of class struggle. Sellars, by contrast, sees the Marxian stage of socialism, not so much scientific as realistic, but he thinks Marxist realism (the recognition that the old order will not easily give way to rational persuasion) led to the introduction of a dangerous militancy into socialism. Further, whereas many saw Marx’s determinism as a strength, Sellars takes Marx’s view that capitalist society contains the seeds of its own destruction as empirically falsified (1970a, 308). Further, Marx underestimated the ability of capitalism to make adjustments (1970a, 284, 286, 307-8; 1944-45b).  Sellars (1970a, 287, 303-304) replaces Marx’s “semi-mechanical and almost wholly deterministic” outlook by the view that the people must learn to emancipate themselves by participation in the political process. Participation in the democratic process requires the development of the necessary virtues: cooperation and ingenuity, the application of continuous experiments to find out what works best, the determination and patience to approach the ultimate goal by slow degrees (1970a, 287).  Whereas Marx seems to absolve the individual of responsibility for the eventual outcome by representing the march towards the goal as the inevitable result of the great supra-individual forces of history, Sellars (1971a, 333-334) emphasizes the essential educative role of the individuals participation in the process that renders the individual prepared for and worthy of the final goal. Although Sellars was sometimes seen as a radical in his day (1970a, 272), he defines socialism as a democratic movement whose aim is to secure the greatest justice and liberty for the maximum number of people at any given time, without the wholesale overturning of tradition by violent methods (1943d).  In opposition to the militant socialism of old, he presents a moderate democratic recipe for achieving socialist goals via “rational reform” while escaping the “vicious dialectic of hate and counter-hate” (1970a, 291, 304). Progress cannot be achieved by one side imposing its view on the whole but by the “interplay” of conservatives on the one side and liberals on the other that the direction and speed of social progress is determined” (1916b, 3; 1970a, 307-308).

7. The Humanist Manifesto

Early in his studies, Sellars considered a career in comparative religion, but with his usual idiosyncratic twist, he wished to do so from a scientific, humanistic, and atheistic point of view. In Evolutionary Naturalism, he describes the religious impulse as “one of the most admirable … in human nature” (1922, 5; see also his 1918, 26 and his 1969a, Ch. 11), but he also holds that religion must be “brought to the world disclosed through science” (1918, 44-45, 222; see also Warren 1975, 24-25).  Given his naturalism, the appeal to supernatural entities and explanations must be eliminated and replaced by an emphasis on human flourishing as citizens of a shared world (Wilson, 1995, Ch. 17).  Whereas religions traditionally conceived salvation as something that comes to man from the outside, Sellars (1918, 12) sees it as something that must arise out of the “loyal union” of human beings who share a belief in the values of life. Traditional religions also often see creation as completed, meaning that a person’s job is merely to understand the pattern in order to follow it, Sellars (1947), reflecting Bergson’s influence, holds that people must learn to recognize creation as “a going concern,” in which their contribution to the further emergence of the universe is essential.

In 1932, Sellars was approached by Raymond Bragg on behalf of a Chicago-based group of humanists associated with The New Humanist (for which Bragg was an associate editor). The group had for some time been contemplating the need for an official statement of the religious humanist position, but recognizing the difficulties inherent in group authorship, chose to have a complete first draft written by a single author. After hearing him lecture in Chicago, Bragg approached Sellars about the project and Sellars accepted with the unanimous support of the Chicago group.  The document published in the following year, the Humanist Manifesto of 1933 (or Humanist Manifesto I), is the result of numerous revisions by multiple contributors upon Sellars’ original draft. While that draft has been lost to history, the fact that Sellars signed the 1933 document, and later-on claimed primary authorship of it, suggests that whatever changes were made did not, in his mind, affect the substance of what he had written. For these reasons it has Sellars as the pre-eminent author of the Manifesto, although that is not to minimize the contributions of others.

In the Manifesto, Sellars attempts to put the essence of his religious humanism into a form suitable not just for fellow professors, but for the general public. It is important to remember that along with many of the original signers of the Humanist Manifesto I, Sellars conceived of humanism not as a replacement for religion but as a new religion (1918, Ch. XVI; 1969d, Ch. 11; Wilson 1995, Ch. 17).  Nevertheless, his naturalized religion shades inevitably into a this-worldly humanist philosophy that, he (1932a, 7) holds, attempts to blend “those two great naturalists, Spinoza and Nietzsche, uniting the passion for life of the one with the cosmic calm of the other.”

Humanist Manifesto I was conceived as the statement of a new secular religion designed to replace the old religions that had been founded on claims of supernatural revelation, or on fear and helplessness (1918c, Foreword).  It opposes an acquisitive and profit-motivated society, and outlines a mutually cooperative worldwide society committed to the rational resolution of problems. Thirty-four of sixty-five persons asked to sign did, including Edwin Burtt of Cornell, and John Dewey and John Hermann Randall of Columbia. About one-third of the signatories were professors from the University of Chicago and from Columbia University; about half were Unitarians (Wilson 1995, Ch. 10).

The Manifesto contains fifteen theses (briefly summarized here):

  1. The universe is self-existing, not created.
  2. Man is a part of nature that has emerged in a continuous process.
  3. Since humanists hold an organic view of life, they reject the traditional mind-body dualism.
  4. Man’s religious culture is a result of gradual natural development as a result of  man’s interaction with the natural environment and social heritage.
  5. Science has shown that supernatural and cosmic guarantors of human values are unsupported, so religion must re-formulate its views in the light of scientific knowledge.
  6. Theism, modernism, and other varieties of “new thought” have been surpassed.
  7. The distinction between the secular and the religious cannot be defended any longer: Nothing that is human is alien to religion.
  8. The purpose of man’s life is the complete realization of the possibilities in human personality.
  9. Humanists find their religious feelings expressed in an intensified sense of their personal lives and the cooperative effort to produce social well-being.
  10. There are no uniquely religious emotions connected with the supernatural.
  11. Man must discourage sentimental hopes and wishful thinking and face the challenges of life by embracing rational procedures.
  12. Religious humanists aim to enhance the creative element in man in order to add to produce a more meaningful life.
  13. All social associations should exist for the promotion of human flourishing.
  14. A socialized cooperative economic system must be established for the fair distribution of the necessities of life to all human beings.
  15. Religious humanists seek to affirm human life rather than deny it, seek to discover the full possibilities of life, not run from them, and aim to establish the conditions of a just and meaningful life for all, not just the privileged few.

For a complete statement of the theses, see Sellars (1970a, 331-335).

Some humanists declined to sign Manifesto I. Dr. Arthur Morgan stated several differences of emphasis, but also some more substantial objections (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Anticipating recent views in “deep ecology” (See Sessions, 1995), Morgan felt that Manifesto I placed too much emphasis on human life and failed to recognize that there may be significance in other life-forms. Morgan called for a “race of businessmen” which sees business as a public trust, not a means to personal enrichment, and he objected to the “unjustified cocksureness” of Manifesto I, feeling that it is “not dictated by humility or imagination”. Morgan also felt that though religion should be disciplined by science, it should not be limited by it.  His most biting criticism was that many humanists are “not strong in faith, hope, and love.”

John Haynes Holmes, the prominent Unitarian minister and noted pacifist, declined to sign Manifesto I since he objected to the rejection of theism in the 6th thesis, holding instead that a rational humanism “inevitably unfolds into a rational theism” (Wilson 1995,Ch. 7). He also found terms like “modernism,” in the 6th thesis “hopelessly vague” and wondered why a humanist could not claim to represent the best of modernism. Although he found the deism of some of the authors “not half bad,” he insists that “Theism … is the blossom that grows on the plant of humanism, the poetry into which it unfolds in mystic beauty”.

Howard Shapley, a Harvard astronomer, spoke for many scientists who were reluctant to make judgments about religion: “As a social philosopher I am embryonic and I have decided that I should not misuse my position by pretending to intelligence or comprehension in a field in which my thoughts have been too scattered and probably too prejudiced” (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Although Shapley agrees with current traditions of protecting the weak, he is not sure that this is in keeping with “the biological traditions of the planet”. His point is not that the weak should not be protected, but that, as a scientist, he cannot claim to know this, and, therefore, he should not put his authority as a scientist behind the claim.

In his retrospective on Humanist Manifesto I, Wilson remarks that he now feels it to be a mistake to tie humanism directly to socialism. Humanism should not be tied to any particular economic system, but should concern itself with the more general goals of ending disease, poverty, ignorance, prejudice, and so forth (Wilson 1995, Ch. 18).

Later versions of the Manifesto found their own objections.  Humanist Manifesto II found the language in Manifesto I to be “far too optimistic” about the possibility of eliminating social evils. Frances Schaeffer (2005) authored A Christian Manifesto (in opposition to the Communist Manifesto) which holds that both the humanist and communist Manifestos, despite significant differences between them, tend to foster similar forms of social degeneration. Schaeffer sees humanism as the unfortunate view that man is the measure of all things, and holds that even if that is not the humanist’s intention Manifesto I undermines the ideals of objective truth and morality. One major difference between Manifesto I and later humanist Manifestos and statements is that Manifesto I arose out of religious humanism (1918, Ch. XVI), and was, accordingly, much more sympathetic to religion per se than these later documents.

The objections by various humanists, both earlier and later, to signing Humanist Manifesto I show just how difficult it is to obtain agreement on such a central issue from such a diverse group of intellectuals representing different fields and backgrounds. Nevertheless, despite the various objections and reservations to Manifesto I, and the various replacement manifestos and declarations that appeared in later years, Manifesto I remains a significant historical document in the genesis of the humanist movement, and one that Sellars, who, it is probably fair to say, is “the principal author” of the published version, played an fundamental role in creating.

8. References and Further Reading

Several of Roy Wood Sellars’ works can be obtained in electronic form at The Internet ArchiveThe Autodidact Project and the online library of The Secular Web. Additional information on the various versions of the Humanist Manifestos and The Amsterdam Declaration is available online from the International Humanist and Ethical Union, the American Humanist Association, and the Council for Secular Humanism.

a. Primary Sources

  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1902. "Re-interpretation of Democracy.” Inlander (University of Michigan publication), 12: 252-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907a. "The Nature of Experience." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods: 14-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907b. "A Fourth Progression in the Relation of Body and Mind." Psychological Review 14: 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907c. "Professor Dewey's View of Agreement." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 4 (16): 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908a. "An Important Antinomy." Psychological Review 15 (4): 237-249.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908b. "Consciousness and Conservation." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (9): 235-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908c. "Critical Realism and the Time Problem I." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (20): 542-48.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908d. "Critical Realism and the Time Problem II." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (27): 597-602. 
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909a. "Causality." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 6: 323-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909b. "Space." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods. 6: 617-23.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1912. "Is There a Cognitive Relation?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 9 (9): 225-328.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1915. "A Thing and its Properties." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 12 (12): 318-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1916a. Critical Realism: A Study of the Nature and Conditions of Knowledge. Chicago: Rand-McNally and Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1916b. The Next Step in Democracy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917a. The Essentials of Logic. Boston: Houghton Mifflin Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917b. The Essentials of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918a. "An Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Philosophical Review 27 (2): 150-63.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918b. "On the Nature of Our Knowledge of the External World." Philosophical Review 27 (5): 502-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918c. The Next Step in Religion. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918d. “Review of P. Coffey, Epistemology, Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 15: 557-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919a. "The Epistemology of Evolutionary Naturalism." Mind 28 (112): 407-26.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919b. “Review of George Wobbermin, Christian Belief in God.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 16: 277-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920a. "The Status of Categories." The Monist 30 (2): 220-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920b. "Space and Time." The Monist 30 (3): 321-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920c. "Evolutionary Naturalism and the Mind-Body Problem." The Monist 30 (4): 568-98.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920d. "Knowledge and Its Categories." Essays in Critical Realism, R.W. Sellars, Durant Drake, A.O. Lovejoy, James Pratt, Arthur Rogers, George Santayana, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 187-219.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920e. “Review of J. A. Leighton, The Field of Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 17: 79-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920f. "Preface." to Evolution of Values, Helen Maud Sellars, (trans.). New York: Henry Holt.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921a. "Epistemological Dualism versus Metaphysical Dualism." Philosophical Review 30 (5): 482-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921b. "The Requirement of an Adequate Naturalism." The Monist 31 (2): 249-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922a. Evolutionary Naturalism. Chicago: Open Court.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922b. "Is Consciousness Physical?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 19 (25): 690-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922c. "Concerning 'Transcendence' and 'Bifurcation'" Mind 31 (121): 31-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1923a. "Le Cerveau, L'âme et La Conscience." Bulletin de la Société Francais de Philosophie: 1-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1923b (some sources say 1922). "The Double Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, N.S. 23: 55-70 (reprinted in Principles of Emergent Realism: 188-201).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924a. "The Emergence of Naturalism." International Journal of Ethics 34 (4): 309-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924b. "Critical Realism and Its Critics." Philosophical Review 33 (4): 379-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926a. The Principles and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926b. "Cognition and Valuation," Philosophical Review 35 (2): 124-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927a. "Realism and Evolutionary Naturalism: A Reply to Professor Hoernlé." The Monist. 37 (1): 150-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927b. "Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States." The Monist 37 (4): 503-520.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927c. "What is the Correct Interpretation of Critical Realism?," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 24 (9): 238-241.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927d. "Why Naturalism and Not Materialism?," Philosophical Review 36 (3): 215-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928a. Religion Coming of Age. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928b. "Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States." Philosophy Today Edward L. Schaub, (ed.). Chicago and London (reprint from The Monist, 1927): 19-36.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929a. "Current Realism." Anthology of Recent Philosophy D. S. Robinson, (ed.). New York: Thomas Y. Crowell Co. (re-print from Philosophy Today): 279-290.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929b. "A Re-examination of Critical Realism." Philosophical Review 38 (5): 439-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929c. "Critical Realism and Substance." Mind 38 (152): 473-88. Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 13-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930a. "A Naturalistic Interpretation of Religion." The New Humanist 3 (4): 1-4.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930b. "Realism, Naturalism and Humanism." in Contemporary American Philosophy G. P. Adams and W. P. Montague, v. 2. (eds.), New York: Macmillan: 261-85.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1931. "Humanism, Viewed and Reviewed." The New Humanist 4 (15): 12-16.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932a. The Philosophy of Physical Realism. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932b. "Reinterpretation of Relativity." Philosophical Review 41 (5): 517-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933a. "L'Hypothèse de l'Émergence." Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 40 (3): 309-24.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933b. "Religious Humanism." The New Humanist 6 (3): 7-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood (Drafter and co-signer). May-June, 1933c. "Humanist Manifesto." The New Humanist 6 (3): 58-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933d. "In Defense of the Manifesto." The New Humanist 6 (6): 6-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933e. “Review of Durant Drake, Introduction to Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 3: 667-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1934. "Nature and Naturalism." The New Humanist 7 (2): 1-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935a. “Review of C. F. Gauss, Primer for Tomorrow.” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review. 41: 465-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935b. "George S. Morris." Dictionary of American Biography 13: 208-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1937a. "Critical Realism and the Independence of the Object." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 34 (20): 541-550.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1937b. "Henry Philip Tappan." Dictionary of American Biography 18: 302-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938a. "An Analytic Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Philosophical Review 47 (5): 461-87.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938b. "A Statement of Critical Realism." Revue Internationale de Philosophie 3: 472-496.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939a. "Positivism in Contemporary Philosophical Thought." American Sociological Review: 26-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939b. "A Clarification of Critical Realism." Philosophy of Science 6 (4): 412-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1940. "Knowledge and its Categories." The Development of American Philosophy, W. G. Muelder and Laurence Sears, (ed’s). Cambridge, Mass: 431-40  (Reprinted from Drake, Durant. 1920. Essays in Critical Realism. New York: Gordian Press: 187-219)
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941a. "Humanism as a Religion." The Humanist 1 (1): 5-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941b. "A Correspondence Theory of Truth." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 38 (24): 653-54.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942a. "Aspects of Democracy II: the Quality of Democracy." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942b. "Galileo Galilei." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 301-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942c. “Review of E. Gilson, God and Philosophy.” The Humanist 2: 36-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942-43. "Dewey on Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 3 (4): 381-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943a. "Science , Philosophy, and Religion." The Humanist 3: 84-5.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943b. "Verification of Categories: Existence and Substance" Journal of Philosophy 40 (8): 197-205.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943c. "Causality and Substance." Philosophical Review.”.  52 (1): 1-27 (Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 26-45).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1943d. "Reason and Revolution," Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review  49: 212-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943e. “Review of J. Maritain, Education at the Cross Roads.” The Humanist 3: 165-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944a. "Causation and Perception." Philosophical Review 53 (6): 534-56.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944b. "Reformed Materialism and Intrinsic Endurance." Philosophical Review. 53: 359-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944c. "Is Naturalism Enough?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (September): 533-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944d. "Does Naturalism Need Ontology?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (25): 686-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944e. "Can a Reformed Materialism Do Justice to Values?" Ethics 55 (1): 28-45.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45a. "The Meaning of True and False." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (1): 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45b. "Reflections on Dialectical Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (2): 157-79.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45c. "Knowing and Knowledge." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 341-344.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45d.  "Knowing through Propositions." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 348-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1945-46. “Review of Yervant Krikorian, Naturalism and the Human Spirit." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  6: 436-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946a. "A Note on the Theory of Relativity." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods  43 (12): 309-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946b. "Materialism and Relativity: A Semantic Analysis." Philosophical Review 55 (1): 25-51.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946c. "Philosophy and Physics of Relativity." Philosophy of Science 13 (3): 177-95.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946-47. "Positivism and Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  7 (1): 12-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1947. "Accept the Universe as a Going Concern." Religious Liberals Reply Henry Wieman, (ed.). Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1948a. "Do the Natural Sciences Have a Need of the Social Sciences?," Philosophy of Science  15 (2): 104-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948b. "Naturalistic Humanism." Religion in the Twentieth Century Vergilius Ferm, (ed.). New York: Littlefield and Adams (later edition date 1958): 415-31.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948c. “Review of A. N. Whitehead, Essays in Science and Philosophy." The Humanist  8: 92-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949a. "Social Philosophy and the American Scene." Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed.’s). New York: Macmillan: 61-75.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949b. "Materialism and Human Knowing." Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 75-106.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949c. "Resume of W. Cook Foundation Lectures.” (delivered by Ralph Barton Perry), Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 55: 185-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood, McGill, V.J., Farber, Marvin. 1949. Forward to Philosophy for the Future, R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: v-xii.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1949-50. “Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 10: 586-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950a. "Critical Realism and Modern Materialism." Philosophical Thought in France and the United States, Marvin Farber, (ed.). Buffalo: The University of Buffalo Publications: 463-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950b. "The New Materialism." A History of Philosophical Systems V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 418-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950c. “Review of Frank Chapman Sharp, Good Will and Ill Will," The Humanist.  10: 277-8
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1950d. "Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 56: 175-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950-51. "The Spiritualism of Lavelle and Le Senne." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 11 (3): 386-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951. "Professor Goudge's Queries with Respect to Materialism." Philosophical Review 60 (2): 243-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1951-52a. "Review of R. W. Boynton, Beyond Mythology." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 146-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951-52b.  "Review of Charles Mayer, “Man: Mind or Matter." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 436-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1952. “Le spiritualisme de Louis Lavelle et de René le sense.” Les Études Philosophiques 9(1/2): 30-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1955. "My Philosophical Position: A Rejoinder." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 16 (1): 72-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956a. "Physical Realism and Relativity: Some Unfinished Business." Philosophy of Science  23 (2): 75-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956b. "Gestalt and Relativity: An Analogy." Philosophy of Science 23 (4): 275-279.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1957a. "Guided Causality, Using Reason and 'Free Will'." Journal of Philosophy 54 (August): 485-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1957b. "Philosophical Orientation and Peace." The Idea of War and Peace in Contemporary Philosophy Irving Louis Horowitz, (ed.). New York: vii-xx (The book was re-released by Literary Licensing Publisher in 2012).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959a. "Levels of Causality: The Emergence of Guidance and Reason in Nature." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  20 (1): 1-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1959b. "Sensations as Guides to Perceiving." Mind 68 (January): 2-15.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959c. "'True' as Contextually Implying Correspondence." Journal of Philosophy 56 (18): 712-22.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood; Lamont, Corliss; Otto, Max; Huxley, Julien; Williams, Gardner; Randall Jr; John Herman. 1959. A Humanist Symposium on Metaphysics. Journal of Philosophy 56 (2): 45-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. October 1960. "Panpsychism or Evolutionary Materialism." Philosophy of Science 27 (October): 229-50.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1961a. "Referential Transcendence." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 22 (1): 1-15.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1961b. "Querying Whitehead's Framework." Revue Internationale de Philosophie 56-57: 135-66.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1962. "American Critical Realism and British Theories of Sense Perception I and II." Methodos: 61-108.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1963. "Direct, Referential Realism." in Dialogue 2 (02): 135-43.         
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1965. "Existentialism, Realistic Empiricism, and Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 25 (3): 315-32.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1968. Lending a Hand to Hylas. Ann Arbor: Edward Brothers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1969a. "A Possible Integration of Science and Philosophy," Zygon 4 (3): 293-97
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1969b. "Some Questions and Suggestions: An Exposition," Journal of Philosophy. 66 (24): 859-60
  • Sellars, R.W. 1969c. “Le naturalisme de Sellars,” Dialectica 23 (1): 79-80
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1969d. Reflections on American Philosophy from Within. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970a. Principles of Emergent Realism. W. Preston Warren, (ed.) . St. Louis: Warren H. Green.
  • This book is really the best place to obtain an overview of R.W. Sellars’ writings with both extensive primary sources and commentary over the course of his development.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970b. Social Patterns and Political Horizons. Nashville: Aurora Publishers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970c. Principles, Perspectives, and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Pageant Press International Corp.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973a. Neglected Alternatives: Critical Essays by Roy Wood Sellars. William. Preston Warren, (ed.), Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973b. January-February. "Toward a New Humanist Manifesto." The Humanist
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1973c. "Recollections of Marvin Farber." In Phenomenology and Natural ExistenceDale Riepe, (ed.). Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1975. Forward to William Preston Warren. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1991. “Philosophy of Organism and Physical Realism”. The Philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead. Paul A. Schlipp, (ed.). LaSalle: Open Court: 407-433 (Original publication date, 1941).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Avery, Jon Henry. 1989. “An Analysis and Critique of Roy Wood Sellars' Descriptive and Normative Theories of Religious Humanism.” PhD diss., The Iliff School of Theology and University of Denver.
  • Bahm, Archie, 1954. "Evolutionary Naturalism." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 1-12.
  • Baker, Richard R. 1950. “The Naturalism of Roy Wood Sellars,” New Scholasticism. 24 (1): 3-31.
  • Beckermann, Angsar, Flohr, Hans, Kim, Jaegwon. 1993. Emergence or Reduction: Essays on the Prospects of Non-Reductive Physicalism. Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Benjamin, Cornelius. 1934. Book Review: “The Philosophy of Physical Realism.” Roy Wood Sellars. Ethics. 44 (2): 270.
  • Bergson, Henri. 1998. Creative Evolution. Arthur Mitchell, (trans.). New York: Dover.
  • Blau, Joseph, 1952. Men and Movements in American Philosophy. New York: Prentice-Hall.
  • Blitz, David. 2010.  Emergent Evolution and Creative Novelty. New York: Springer.
  • Bogomolov, A.S. 1962. “Roy Wood Sellars in the Materialist Theory of Knowledge,” Russian Studies in Philosophy. 1 (3): 31-32.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1955. "Critical Realism," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 15 (1): 33-47.
  • Davies, Paul, Clayton, Philip, (ed’s). 2008.  The Re-Emergence of Emergence: The Emergentist Hypothesis from Science to Religion. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Delaney, C. F., 1969. Mind and Nature: A Study of the Naturalistic Philosophy of Cohen, Woodbridge and Sellars. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Delaney, C. F. 1971. "Sellars and the Contemporary Mind-Body Problem," The New Scholasticism 45: 245-68.
  • Emmet, Dorothy. 1932. Whitehead’s Philosophy of Organism. London: Macmillan.
  • Ferm, Vergilius. 1950. “Varieties of Naturalism,” A History of Philosophical Systems. V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 429-441.
  • Frankena, William. 1954. "Theory of Valuation," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 15 (1): 65-81.
  • Frankena, William. Dec. 1973. “Roy Wood Sellars: Obituary,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 34 (2): 300-301.
  • Frankena, William. 1973-74. “Roy Wood Sellars: Memoriam,” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 47: 230-232.
  • Gluck, Samuel E. 1971. Review of  Norman Paul Melchert’s Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Illinois: Charles C. Thomas. Philosophy 46 (177): 281ff.
  • Grayling, A.C. 2003. Meditations for the Humanist: Ethics for a Secular Age. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Griffin, James Phillip,  1966. “Foundations of Ethical Value in the Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars and William Temple.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Hasker, William. 2001. The Emergent Self. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Herbert, David. 1994. “A New Critical Realism: An Examination of Roy Wood Sellars’ Epistemology,” Transactions of the Charles Sanders Peirce Society 30 (3): 477 - 514.
  • Hoor, Marten. 1954.  "Humanism as a Religion," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 84-97.
  • Hudson, Yeager. 1965. “Metaphysical Causality in the Philosophies of Brand Blanshard, Roy Wood Sellars, and John Laird.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Iobst, Philip Kirschman. 1975. The Normative Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars: A Critical Examination, Ph. D. Dissertation, State University of New York at Buffalo
  • Kreyche, Robert.  1951. “The Naturalism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Ottawa.
  • Kuiper, John. 1954 (some references say 1955). "The Mind-Body Problem," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (September): 46-84.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1973. Humanist Manifestos I and II. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1981. “The Arrogance of Humanism,”  International Studies in Philosophy 13 (1):91-93.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1983. A Secular Humanist Declaration. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2000. Humanist Manifesto 2000: A Call for a New Planetary Humanism. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Levine, Steven. 2007. “Sellars’ Critical Direct Realism,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 15 (1): 53-76.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2007. What is Secular Humanism? Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Lamont, Corliss. 1997. The Philosophy of Humanism.  Washington, D.C: Humanist Press.
  • McDonough, Richard. 2002. “Emergence and Creativity: Five Degrees of Freedom,” Creativity, Cognition, and Knowledge Terry Dartnall, (ed.). Westport, Connecticut: Praeger: 283-321.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1964. “An Examination of the Physical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Pennsylvania.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1968. Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Ill.: Charles C. Thomas.
  • Munk, Arthur W. P. 1945. “Roy Wood Sellars' Criticism of Idealism.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Ramsperger, A.G.  1967. “Critical Realism” Encyclopedia of Philosophy, v. 2. Paul Edwards., (ed.) (New York: Macmillan and the Free Press: 262-263.
  • Reck, Andrew. 1962. Recent American Philosophy: Studies of Ten Representative Thinkers. New York: Pantheon Books.
  • Reck, Andrew. 1971. "The Realism of Roy Wood Sellars," The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 209-44.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1949. “Aristotelian Philosophies of Mind”. Philosophy for the Future, Roy Wood Sellars, V.J. McGill, Marvin Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 544-570.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1955. "Physical Realism," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 13-32.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, and Meehl, Paul. 1956. “The Concept of Emergence,” Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, v. 1.  Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press: 239-252.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1965. “The Identity Approach to the Mind-Body Problem,” Review of Metaphysics 18 (March): 430-51.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, 1971. "The Double-Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem," The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 269-89. (Note that Roy had published an article with the same title in 1923)
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1991. “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man,” Science, Perception and Reality Atascadero, California: Ridgeview: 1-40.
  • Schaeffer, Francis. 2005. A Christian Manifesto. Wheaton, Illinois: Crossway Books.
  • Sessions, George. 1995. Deep Ecology for the Twenty-First Century. Boston: Shambhal.
  • Slurink, Pouwel. 1996. “Back to Roy Wood Sellars: Why His Evolutionary Naturalism is Still Worthwhile,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 34 (3):425-44.
  • Rowntree, Clifford. 1964. “Direct, Referential Realism: A Comment,” Dialogue 2 (04): 452-453.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. 2002. “Emergence,” Philosophical Studies 58 (1-2): 53-63.
  • Trelo, Virgil J. 1966. The Critical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars. Lisle, Ill.: St. Procopius College.
  • Vintiadis, Elly. “Emergence,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy
  • Warren, William Preston. 1967. "Realism 1900-1930: An Emerging Epistemology," The Monist. 51 (2): 179-205.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1970. Introduction to Roy Wood Sellars. Principles of Emergent Realism, W. Preston Warren, (ed.). St. Louis: Warren H. Green: xi-xxiv.
  • Warren, William Preston, 1972a. "Foundations of Philosophy," Bucknell Review 19 (3): 69-100.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1972b. "Experimentalism Plus," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 33 (2): 149-82.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1973a. “A Brief Biography of Roy Wood Sellars,” Neglected Alternatives: Critical Essays by Roy Wood Sellars. W. Preston Warren, (ed.). Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press: 19-22.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1973b. Preface to Roy Wood Sellars’ Neglected Alternatives. Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press: 7-15.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1975. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • This book is probably the best sympathetic secondary source on R.W. Sellars’ views.
  • Werkmeister, W. H. 1981. History of Philosophical Ideas in the United States. New York: Ronald Press.
  • Warren, William Preston. 2007. “Roy Wood Sellars: Philosopher of Religious Humanism,” Notable American Unitarians, Herbert Vetter, (ed.).  Cambridge, Harvard Square Library: 211-213.
  • Wilson, Edwin. 1995. The Genesis of a Humanist Manifesto. Amherst, NY. Humanist Press.
  • Wood, Ledger. 1950. “Recent Epistemological Schools,” A History of Philosophical Systems, V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 516-539.
  • Wright, Edmund. 1994. “A New Critical Realism: An Examination of the Critical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars,” Transactions of the Charles Sanders Pierce Society 30 (3): 477-514.

 

Author Information

Richard McDonough
Email: rmm249@cornell.edu
Arium School of Arts & Sciences
Singapore

Leibniz: Logic

LeibnizThe revolutionary ideas of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) on logic were developed by him between 1670 and 1690. The ideas can be divided into four areas: the Syllogism, the Universal Calculus, Propositional Logic, and Modal Logic.

These revolutionary ideas remained hidden in the Archive of the Royal Library in Hanover until 1903 when the French mathematician Louis Couturat published the Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz. Couturat was a great admirer of Leibniz’s thinking in general, and he saw in Leibniz a brilliant forerunner of modern logic. Nevertheless he came to the conclusion that Leibniz’s logic had largely failed and that in general the so-called “intensional” approach to logic was necessarily bound to fail. Similarly, in their standard historiography of logic, W. & M. Kneale (1962) maintained that Leibniz “never succeeded in producing a calculus which covered even the whole theory of the syllogism”. Even in recent years, scholars like Liske (1994), Swoyer (1995), and Schupp (2000) argued that Leibniz’s intensional conception must give rise to inconsistencies and paradoxes.

On the other hand, starting with Dürr (1930), Rescher (1954), and Kauppi (1960), a certain rehabilitation of Leibniz’s intensional logic may be observed which was by and by supported and supplemented by Poser (1969), Ishiguro (1972), Rescher (1979), Burkhardt (1980), Schupp (1982), and Mugnai (1992). However, the full wealth of Leibniz’s logical ideas became visible only in Lenzen (1990), (2004a), and (2004b), where the many pieces and fragments were joined together to an impressive system of four calculi:

  • The algebra of concepts L1 (which turns out to be deductively equivalent to the Boolean algebra of sets)
  • The quantificational system L2 (where “indefinite concepts” function as quantifiers ranging over concepts)
  • A propositional calculus of strict implication (obtained from L1 by the strict analogy between the containment-relation among concepts and the inference-relation among propositions)
  • The so-called “Plus-Minus-Calculus” (which is to be viewed as a theory of set-theoretical containment, “addition,” and “subtraction”).

Table of Contents

  1. Leibniz’s Logical Works
  2. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism
    1. Axiomatization of the Theory of the Syllogism
    2. The Semantics of “Characteristic Numbers”
    3. Linear Diagrams and Euler-circles
  3. Works on the Universal Calculus
    1. The Algebra of Concepts L1
    2. The Quantificational System L2
    3. The Plus-Minus-Calculus
  4. Leibniz’s Calculus of Strict Implication
  5. Works on Modal Logic
    1. Possible-Worlds-Semantics for Alethic Modalities
    2. Basic Principles of Deontic Logic
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Abbreviations for Leibniz’s works
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Leibniz’s Logical Works

Throughout his life (beginning in 1646 in Leipzig and ending in 1716 in Hanover), Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz did not publish a single paper on logic, except perhaps for the mathematical dissertation “De Arte Combinatoria” and the juridical disputa­tion “De Conditionibus” (GP 4, 27-104 and AE IV, 1, 97-150; the abbrevi­ations for Leibniz’s works are resolved in section 6). The former work deals with some issues in the theory of the syllogism, while the latter contains investigations of what is nowadays called deontic logic. Leibniz’s main aim in logic, however, was to extend the traditional syllogistic to a “Universal Calculus.” Although there exist several drafts of such a calculus which seem to have been composed for publication, none of them was eventually sent to press. So Leibniz’s logical essays appeared only posthumously. The early editions of his philosophical works, however, contained only a small selection of logical papers. It was not before the beginning of the 20th century that the majority of his logical fragments became generally accessible by the valuable edition of Louis Couturat.

Since only few manuscripts were dated by Leibniz, his logical oeuvre shall not be described here in chronological order but from a merely systematic point of view by distinguishing four groups:

  1. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism
  2. Works on the Universal Calculus
  3. Works on Propositional Logic
  4. Works on Modal Logic.

2. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism

Leibniz’s innovations within the theory of the syllogism comprise at least three topics:

(a)   An "Axiomatization" of the theory of the syllogism, that is, a reduction of the traditional inferences to a small number of basic laws which are sufficient to derive all other syllogisms.

(b)   The development of the semantics of so-called "characteristic num­bers" for evaluating the logical validity of a syllogistic inference.

(c)    The invention of two sorts of graphical devices, that is to say, linear diagrams and (later) so-called "Euler-circles," as a heuristic for checking the validity of a syllogism.

a. Axiomatization of the Theory of the Syllogism

In the 17th century, logic was still strongly influenced, if not dominated, by syllogistic, that is, by the traditional theory of the four categorical forms:

Universal affirmative proposition (UA)        Every S is P          SaP

Universal negative proposition (UN)              No S is P               SeP

Particular affirmative proposition (PA)         Some S is P          SiP

Particular negative proposition (PN)              Some S isn’t P      SoP

A typical textbook of that time is the famous “Logique de Port Royal” (Arnauld & Nicole (1683)) which, apart from an introductory investigation of ideas, concepts, and propositions in general, basically consists of:

(i)       The theory of the so-called “simple” laws of subalternation, oppo­sition, and conversion;

(ii)      The theory of the syllogistic “moods” which are classified into four different “figures” for which specific rules hold.

As Leibniz defines it, a “subalternation takes place whenever a particular proposition is inferred from the corresponding universal proposition” (Cout, 80), that is:

SUB 1            SaP → SiP

SUB 2            SeP → SoP.

According to the modern analysis of the categorical forms in terms of first order logic, these laws are not strictly valid but hold only under the assumption that the subject term S is not empty. This problem of "existential import" will be discussed below.

The theory of opposition first has to determine which propositions are contradictories of each other in the sense that they can neither be together true nor be together false. Clearly, the PN is the contradictory, or negation, of the UA, while the PA is the negation of the UN:

OPP 1            ¬SaP ↔ SoP

OPP 2            ¬SeP ↔ SiP.

The next task is to determine which propositions are contraries to each other in the sense that they cannot be together true, while they may well be together false. As Leibniz states in “Theorem 6: The universal affirmative and the universal negative are contrary to each other” (Cout, 82). Finally, two propositions are said to be subcontraries if they cannot be together false while it is possible that are together true. As Leibniz notes in another theorem, the two particular propositions, SiP and SoP, are logically related to each other in this way. The theory of subalternation and opposition is often summarized in the familiar “Square of Opposition”:

leibniz_logic_graphic1

In the paper “De formis syllogismorum Mathematice definiendis” written around 1682 (Cout, 410-416, and the text-critical edition in AE VI, 4, 496-505) Leibniz tackled the task of "axiomatizing" the theory of the syllogistic figures and moods by reducing them to a small number of basic principles. The “Fundamentum syllogisticum”, that is, the axiomatic basis of the theory of the syllogism, is the “Dictum de omni et nullo” (The saying of ‘all’ and ‘none’):

If a total C falls within another total D, or if the total C falls outside D, then whatever is in C, also falls within D (in the former case) or outside D (in the latter case) (Cout, 410-411).

These laws warrant the validity of the following "perfect" moods of the “First Figure”:

BARBARA        CaD, BaC → BaD

CELARENT      CeD, BaC → BeD

DARII                 CaD, BiC → BiD

FERIO                 CeD, BiC → BoD.

On the one hand, if the second premise of the affirmative moods BARBARA and DARII is satisfied, that is, if B is either totally or partially contained in D, then, according to the “Dictum de Omni”, also B must be either totally or partially contained in D since, by the first premise, C is entirely contained in D. Similarly the negative moods CELARENT and FERIO follow from the “Dictum de Nullo”: “B is either totally or partially contained in C; but the entire C falls outside D; hence also B either totally or partially falls outside D” (Cout, 411).

Next Leibniz derives the laws of subalternation from the syllogisms DARII and FERIO by substituting ‘B’ for ‘C’ and ‘C’ for ‘D’, respectively. This derivation (and hence also the validity of the laws of subalternation) tacitly presupposes the following principle which Leibniz considered as an “identity”:

SOME             BiB.

With the help of the laws of subalternation, BARBARA and CELARENT may be "weakened" into

BARBARI      CaD, BaC → BiD

CELARO        CeD, BaC → BoD.

Thus the First Figure altogether has six valid moods, from which one obtains six moods of the Second and six of the Third Figure by means of a logical inference-scheme called “Regressus”:

REGRESS      If a conclusion Q logically follows from premises P1, P2, but if Q is false, then one of the premises must be false.

When Leibniz carefully carries out these derivations, he presupposes the laws of opposition, Opp 1, Opp 2. Finally, six valid moods of the Fourth Figure can be derived from corresponding moods of the First Figure with the help of the laws of conversions.According to traditional doctrines, the PA and the UN may be converted “simpliciter”, while the UA can only be converted “per accidens”:

CONV 1          BiD → DiB

CONV 2          BeD → DeB

CONV 3          BaD → DiB.

As Leibniz shows, these laws can in turn be derived from some previously proven syllogisms with the help of the "identical" proposition:

ALL                BaB.

Furthermore one easily obtains another law of conversion according to which the UN can also be converted "accidentally":

CONV 4          BeD → DoB.

The announced derivation of the moods of the Fourth Figure was not carried out in the fragment “De formis syllogismorum Mathematice definiendis” which just breaks off with a reference to “Figura Quarta”. It may, however, be found in the manuscript LH IV, 6, 14, 3 which, unfortunately, was only partially edited in Cout, 204. At any rate, Leibniz managed to prove that all valid moods can be reduced to the “Fundamentum syllogisticum” in conjunction with the laws of opposition, the inference scheme “Regressus”, and the "identical" propositions SOME and ALL.

Now while ALL is an identity or theorem of first order logic, ∀x(Bx → Bx), SOME is nowadays interpreted as ∃x(Bx ∧ Bx). This formula is equivalent to ∃x(Bx), that is, to the assumption that there "exists" at least one x such that x is B. Hence the laws of subalternation presuppose that each concept B (which can occupy the position of the subject of a categorical form) is "non-empty". Leibniz discussed this problem of "existential import" in a paper entitled “Difficultates quaedam logicae” (GP 7, 211-217) where he distinguished two kinds of "existence": Actual existence of the individuals inhabiting our real world vs. merely possible subsistence of individuals “in the region of ideas”. According to Leibniz, logical inferences should always be evaluated with reference to “the region of ideas”, that is, the larger set of all possible individuals. Therefore all that is required for the validity of subalternation is that the term B occupying the position of the subject of a categorical form has a non-empty extension within the domain of possible individuals. As will turn out below (compare the definition of an extensional interpretation of L1 in section 3.1), this weak condition of "existential import" becomes tantamount to the assumption that the respective concept B is self-consistent!

b. The Semantics of “Characteristic Numbers”

In a series of papers of April 1679, Leibniz elaborated the idea of assigning natural numbers to the subject and predicate of a proposition a in such a way that the truth of a can be "read off" from these numbers. Apparently Leibniz was hoping that mankind might once discover the "true" characteristic numbers which would enable one to determine the truth of arbitrary propositions just by mathematical calculations! In the essays of April 1679, however, he pursued only the much more modest goal of defining appropriate arithmetical conditions for determining whether a syllogistic inference is logically valid. This task was guided by the idea that a term composed of concepts A and B gets assigned the product of the numbers assigned to the components:

For example, since ‘man’ is ‘rational animal’, if the number of ‘animal’, a, is 2, and the number of ‘rational’, r, is 3, then the number of ‘man’, m, will be the same as a*r, in this example 2*3 or 6. (LLP, 17).

Now a UA like ‘All gold is metal’ can be understood as maintaining that the concept ‘gold’ contains the concept ‘metal’ (because ‘gold’ can be defined as ‘the heaviest metal’). Therefore it seems obvious to postulate that in general ‘Every S is P’ is true if and only if s, the characteristic number assigned to S, contains p, the number assigned to P, as a prime factor; or, in other words, s must be divisible by p. In a first approach, Leibniz thought that the truth-conditions for the particular proposition ‘Some S are P’ might be construed similarly by requiring that either s can be divided by p or conversely p can be divided by s. But this was mistaken. After some trials and errors, Leibniz found the following more complicated solution:

(i)     To every term T, a pair of natural numbers <+t1;-t2> is assigned such that t1 and t2 are relatively prime, that is, they don’t have a common divisor.

(ii)    The UA ‘Every S is P’ is true (relative to the assignment (i)) if and only if +s1 is divisible by +p1 and -s2 is divisible by -p2.

(iii)   The UN ‘No S is P’ is true if and only if +s1 and -p2 have a common divisor or +p1 and -s2 have a common divisor.

(iv)   The PA ‘Some S is P’ is true if and only if condition (iii) is not satisfied.

(v)    The PN ‘Some S isn’t P’ is true if and only if condition (ii) is not satisfied.

(vi)   An inference from premises P1, P2 to the conclusion C is logically valid if and only if for each assignment of numbers satisfying condition (i), C becomes true whenever both P1 and P2 are true.

As was shown by Lukasiewicz (1951), this semantics satisfies the simple inferences of opposition, subalternation, and conversion, as well as all (and only) the syllogisms which are commonly regarded as valid. Leibniz tried to generalize this semantics for the entire algebra of concepts, but he never found a way to cope with negative concepts. This problem has only been solved by contemporary logicians; compare Sanchez-Mazas (1979), Sotirov (1999).

c. Linear Diagrams and Euler-circles

In the paper “De Formae Logicae Comprobatione per Linearum ductus” probably written after 1686 (Cout, 292-321), Leibniz elaborated two methods for representing the content of categorical propositions. The UA, for example, ‘Every man is an animal’, can be represented either by two nested circles or by two horizontal lines which symbolize that the extension of B is contained in the extension of C (the subsequent graphics are scans from Cout, 292-295):

leibniz_logic_graphic2

In the case of a UN like ‘No man is a stone’, one obtains the following diagrams which symbolize that the extension of B is set-theoretically disjoint from the extension of C:

leibniz_logic_graphic3

Similarly, the following circles and lines symbolize that, in the case of a PA like ‘Some men are wise’, the extensions of B and C overlap:

leibniz_logic_graphic4

Finally, in the case of a PN like ‘Some men are not ruffians’, the diagrams are meant to symbolize that the extension of B is partially disjoint from the extension of C,that is, that some elements of B are not elements of C:

leibniz_logic_graphic5

These diagrams may then be used to check whether a given inference is valid. Thus, for example, the validity of FERIO can be illustrated as follows:

leibniz_logic_graphic6

Here the conclusion ‘Some D is not B’ follows from the premises ‘No C is B’ and ‘Some D is C’ because the elements of D which are in C can’t be elements of B. On the other hand, invalid syllogisms as, for example, the mood “AOO” of the Fourth Figure, can be refuted as follows:

leibniz_logic_graphic7

As the diagram illustrates, the truth of the premises ‘Every B is C’ and ‘Some C is not D’ is compatible with a situation where the conclusion ‘Some D is not B’ is false, that is, where ‘Every D is B’ is true.

Of course, Leibniz’s diagrams which were re-discovered in the 18th century among others by Euler (1768) are not without problems. In particular, the circles for the PA and the PN are somewhat inaccurate because they basic­ally visualize one and the same state of affairs, namely that (i) some B are C, and (ii) some B are not C, and also (iii) some C are not B. The need to distinguish between different situations such as ((i) & (ii)) in contrast to ((i) & not (ii)) led to improvements of the method of "Euler-circles" as suggested by Venn (1881), Hamilton (1861), and others. Note, incidentally, that, in the GI, Leibniz himself improved the linear diagrams for the UA, PA and PN by drawing perpendicular lines symbolizing the “maximum”,that is, “the limits beyond which the terms cannot, and within which they can, be extended”. At the same time he used a double horizontal line to symbolize “the minimum, that is, that which cannot be taken away without affecting the relation of the terms” (LLP, 73-4, fn. 2).

3. Works on the Universal Calculus

In the period between, roughly, 1679 and 1690, Leibniz spent much effort to generalize the traditional logic to a “Universal Calculus”. At least three different calculi may be distinguished:

(a) The algebra of concepts which is provably equivalent to the Boolean algebra of sets;

(b)   A fragmentary quantificational system in which the quantifiers range over concepts but in which quantification over individuals may be introduced by definition;

(c) The so-called "Plus-Minus-calculus" which constitutes an abstract system of "real addition" and "subtraction". When this calculus is applied to concepts, it yields a weaker logic than the full algebra (a).

a. The Algebra of Concepts L1

The algebra of concepts grows out of the syllogistic framework by three achievements. First, Leibniz drops the informal quantifier expression ‘every’ and formulates the UA simply as “A is B” or, equivalently, as “A contains B”. This fundamental proposition shall here be symbolized as A∈B while its negation will be abbreviated as A∉B. Second, Leibniz introduces an operator of conceptual conjunction which combines two concepts A and B into AB (sometimes also written as “A+B”). Third, Leibniz allows the unrestricted use of conceptual negation which shall here be symbolized as ~A (“Not-A”). Hence, in particular, one can form the inconsistent concept A~A (“A Not-A”) and its tautological counterpart ~(A~A).

Identity or coincidence of concepts might be defined as mutual containment:

DEF 1            (A = B) =df (A∈B) ∧ (B∈A).

Alternatively, the algebra of concepts can be built up with ‘=’ as a primitive operator while ‘∈’ is defined by:

DEF 2            (A∈B) =df (A = AB).

Another important operator may be introduced by definition. Concept B is possible if B does not contain a contradiction like A~A:

DEF 3            P(B) =df (B∉A~A).

Leibniz uses many different locutions to express the self-consistency of a concept A. Instead of ‘A est possibile’ he often says ‘A est res’, ‘A est ens’; or simply ‘A est’. In the opposite case of an impossible concept he also calls A a "false term" (“terminus falsus”).

Identity can be axiomatized by the law of reflexivity in conjunction with the rule of substitutivity:

IDEN 1            A = A

IDEN 2            If A = B, then α[A] ↔ α[B].

By means of these principles, one easily derives the following corollaries:

IDEN 3            A = B → B = A

IDEN 4            A = B ∧ B = C → A = C

IDEN 5            A = B → ~A = ~B

IDEN 6            A = B → AC = BC.

The following laws express the reflexivity and the transitivity of the containment relation:

CONT 1          A∈A

CONT 2          A∈B ∧ B∈C → A∈C.

The most fundamental principle for the operator of conceptual conjunction says: “That A contains B and A contains C is the same as that A contains BC” (LLP, 58, fn. 4), that is,

CONJ 1          A∈BC ↔ A∈B ∧ A∈C.

Conjunction then satisfies the following laws:

CONJ 2          AA = A

CONJ 3          AB = BA

CONJ 4          AB∈A

CONJ 5          AB∈B.

The next operator is conceptual negation, ‘not’. Leibniz had serious problems with finding the proper laws governing this operator. From the tradition, he knew little more than the “law of double negation”:

CONJ 1            ~~A = A

One important step towards a complete theory of conceptual negation was to transform the informal principle of contraposition, ‘Every A is B, therefore Every Not-B is Not-A’ into the following principle:

NEG 2            A∈B ↔ ~B∈~A.

Furthermore Leibniz discovered various variants of the “law of consistency”:

NEG 3            A ≠ ~A

NEG 4            A = B → A ≠ ~B.

NEG 5*           A∉~A

NEG 6*           A∈B → A∉~B.

In the GI, these principles are formulated as follows: “A proposition false in itself is ‘A coincides with Not-A’” (§ 11); “If A = B, then A ≠ Not-B” (§ 171); “It is false that B contains Not-B, that is, B doesn’t contain Not-B” (§ 43); and “A is B, therefore A isn’t Not-B” (§ 91).

Principles NEG 5* and NEG 6* have been marked with a ‘*’ in order to indicate that the laws as stated by Leibniz are not absolutely valid but have to be restricted to self-consistent terms:

NEG 5            P(A) → A∉~A

NEG 6            P(A) → (A∈B → A∉~B).

The following two laws describe some characteristic relations between the possibility-operator P and the other operators of L1:

POSS 1           A∈B ∧ P(A) → P(B)

POSS 2           A∈B ↔ ¬P(A~B).

All these principles have been discovered by Leibniz himself who thus provided an almost complete axiomatization of L1. As a matter of fact, the "intensional" algebra of concept can be proven to be equivalent to Boole’s extensional algebra of sets provided that one adds the following counterpart of the “ex contradictorio quodlibet”:

NEG 7            (A~A)∈B.

As regards the relation of conceptual containment, A∈B, it is important to observe that Leibniz’s standard formulation ‘A contains B’ expresses the so-called "intensional" view of concepts as ideas, while we here want to develop an extensional interpretation in terms of the sets of individuals that fall under the concepts. Leibniz explained the mutual relationship between the "intensional" and the extensional point of view in the following passage from the “New Essays on Human understanding”:

The common manner of statement concerns individuals, whereas Aristotle’s refers rather to ideas or universals. For when I say Every man is an animal I mean that all the men are included among all the animals; but at the same time I mean that the idea of animal is included in the idea of man. ‘Animal’ comprises more individuals than ‘man’ does, but ‘man’ comprises more ideas or more attributes: one has more instances, the other more degrees of reality; one has the greater extension, the other the greater intension. (NE, Book IV, ch. XVII, § 8; compare the original French version in GP 5, 469).

If 'Int(A)’ and 'Ext(A)’ abbreviate the "intension" and the extension of a concept A, respectively, then the so-called law of reciprocity can be formalized as follows:

RECI               Int(A) ⊆ Int (B) ↔ Ext(A) ⊇ Ext(B).

From this it immediately follows that two concepts A, B have the same "intension" iff they have the same extension. This somewhat surprising result might seem to unveil an inadequacy of Leibniz’s conception. However, "intensionality" in the sense of traditional logic must not be mixed up with intensionality in the modern sense. Furthermore, in Leibniz’s view, the extension of a concept A is not just the set of actually existing individuals, but rather the set of all possible individuals that fall under concept A. Therefore one may define the concept of an extensional interpretation of L1 in accordance with Leibniz’s ideas as follows:

DEF 4      Let U be a non-empty set (the domain of all possible indi­viduals), and let ϕ be a function such that ϕ(A) ⊆ U for each concept-letter A. Then ϕ is an extensional interpretation of L1 if and only if:

(1) ϕ(A∈B) = true iff ϕ(A) ⊆ ϕ(B);

(2) ϕ(A=B) = true iff ϕ(A) = ϕ(B);

(3) ϕ(AB) = ϕ(A) ∩ ϕ(B);

(4) ϕ(~A) = complement of ϕ(A);

(5) ϕ(P(A)) = true iff ϕ(A) ≠ ∅.

Conditions (1) and (2) are straightforward consequences of RECI. Condition (3) also is trivial since it expresses that an individual x belongs to the extension of AB just in case that x belongs to the extension of both concepts (and hence to their intersection). According to condition (4), the extension of the negative concept ~A is just the set of all individuals which do not fall under the concept A. Condition (5) says that a concept A is possible if and only if it has a non-empty extension.

At first sight, this requirement appears inadequate, since there are certain concepts – such as that of a unicorn – which happen to be empty but which may nevertheless be regarded as possible, that is, not involving a contradiction. However, the universe of discourse underlying the extensional interpretation of L1 does not consist of actually existing objects only, but instead comprises all possible individuals. Therefore the non-emptiness of the extension of A is both necessary and sufficient for guaranteeing the self-consistency of A. Clearly, if A is possible, then there must be at least one possible individual x that falls under concept A.

It has often been noted that Leibniz’s logic of concepts lacks the operator of disjunction. Although this is by and large correct, it doesn’t imply any defect or any incompleteness of the system L1 because the operator A∨B may simply be introduced by definition:

DISJ 1            A∨B =df ~(~A ~B).

On the background of the above axioms of negation and conjunction, the standard laws for disjunction, for example

DISJ 2            A∈(A∨B)

DISJ 3            B∈(A∨B)

DISJ 4            A∈C ∧ B∈C → (A∨B)∈C,

then become provable (Lenzen (1984)).

b. The Quantificational System L2

Leibniz’s quantifier logic L2 emerges from L1 by the introduction of so-called “indefinite concepts”. These concepts are symbolized by letters from the end of the alphabet X, Y, Z ..., and they function as quantifiers ranging over concepts. Thus, in the GI, Leibniz explains:

(16) An affirmative proposition is ‘A is B’ or ‘A contains B’ [...]. That is, if we substitute the value for A, one obtains ‘A coincides with BY’. For example, ‘Man is an animal’, that is, ‘Man’ is the same as ‘a ... animal’ (namely, ‘Man’ is ‘rational animal’). For by the sign ‘Y’ I mean something undetermined, so that ‘BY’ is the same as ‘Some B’, or ‘A ... animal’ [...], or ‘A certain animal’. So ‘A is B’ is the same as ‘A coincides with some B’, that is, ‘A = BY’.

With the help of the modern symbol for the existential quantifier, the latter law can be expressed more precisely as follows:

CONT 3          A∈B ↔ ∃Y(A = BY).

As Leibniz himself noted, the formalization of the UA according to CONT 3 is provably equivalent to the simpler representation according to DEF 2:

It is noteworthy that for ‘A = BY’ one can also say ‘A = AB’ so that there is no need to introduce a new letter. (Cout, 366; compare also LLP, 56, fn. 1.)

On the one hand, according to the rule of existential generalization,

EXIST 1          If α[A], then ∃Yα[Y],

A = AB immediately entails ∃Y(A = YB). On the other hand, if there exists some Y such that A = YB, then according to IDEN 6, AB = YBB, that is, AB = YB and hence (by the premise A = YB) AB = A. (This proof incidentally was given by Leibniz himself in the important paper “Primaria Calculi Logic Fundamenta” of August 1690; Cout, 235).

Next observe that Leibniz often used to formalize the PA ‘Some A is B’ by means of the indefinite concept Y as ‘YA∈B’. In view of CONT 3, this repre­sentation might be transformed into the (elliptic) equation YA = ZB. However, both formalizations are somewhat inadequate because they are easily seen to be theorems of L2! According to CONJ 4, BA contains B, hence by EXIST 1:

CONJ 6          ∃Y(YA∈B).

Similarly, since, according to CONJ 3, AB = BA, a twofold application of EXIST 1 yields:

CONJ 7          ∃Y∃Z(YA = BZ).

These tautologies, of course, cannot adequately represent the PA which for an appropriate choice of concepts A and B may become false! In order to resolve these difficulties, consider a draft of a calculus probably written between 1686 and 1690 (compare Cout, 259-261, and the text-critical edition in AE, VI, 4, # 171), where Leibniz proved principle:

NEG 8*           A∉B ↔ ∃Y(YA∈~B).

On the one hand, it is interesting to see that after first formulating the right hand side of the equivalence, "as usual", in the elliptic way ‘YA is Not-B’, Leibniz later paraphrased it by means of the explicit quantifier expression “there exists a Y such that YA is Not-B”. On the other hand, Leibniz discovered that NEG 8* has to be improved by requiring more exactly that there exists a Y such that YA contains ~B and YA is possible, that is, Y must be compatible with A:

NEG 8            A∉B ↔ ∃Y(P(YA) ∧ YA∈~B).

Leibniz’s proof of this important law is quite remarkable:

(18) […] to say ‘A isn’t B’ is the same as to say ‘there exists a Y such that YA is Not-B’. If ‘A is B’ is false, then ‘A Not-B’ is possible by [POSS 2]. ‘Not-B’ shall be called ‘Y’. Hence YA is possible. Hence YA is Not-B. Therefore we have shown that, if it is false that A is B, then QA is Not-B. Conversely, let us show that if QA is Not-B, ‘A is B’ is false. For if ‘A is B’ would be true, ‘B’ could be substituted for ‘A’ and we would obtain ‘QB is Not-B’ which is absurd. (Cout, 261)

To conclude the sketch of L2, let us consider some of the rare passages where an indefinite concept functions as a universal quantifier. In the above quoted draft (Cout, 260), Leibniz put forward principle “(15) ‘A is B’ is the same as ‘If L is A, it follows that L is B’”:

CONT 4          A∈B ↔ ∀Y(Y∈A → Y∈B).

Furthermore, in § 32 GI, Leibniz at least vaguely recognized that just as A∈B (according to CONJ 6) is equivalent to ∃Y(A = YB), so the negation A∉B means that, for any indefinite concept Y, A ≠ BY:

CONT 5          A∉B ↔ ∀Y(A ≠ YB).

According to AE, VI, 4, 753, Leibniz had written: “(32) Propositio Negativa. A non continet B, seu A esse (continere) B falsum est, seu A non coincidit BY”. Unfortunately, the last passage ‘seu A non coincidit BY’ had been overlooked by Couturat and it is therefore also missing in Parkinson’s translation in LLP! Anyway, with the help of ‘∀’, one can formalize Leibniz’s conception of individual concepts as maximally-consistent concepts as follows:

IND 1             Ind(A) ↔df P(A) ∧ ∀Y(P(AY) → A∈Y).

Thus A is an individual concept iff A is "self-consistent and A contains every concept Y which is compatible with A. The underlying idea of the complete­ness of individual concepts had been formulated in § 72 GI as follows:

So if BY is ["being"], and the indefinite term Y is superfluous, that is, in the way that ‘a certain Alexander the Great’ and ‘Alexander the Great’ are the same, then B is an individual. If the term BA is ["being"] and if B is an individual, then A will be superfluous; or if BA=C, then B=C (LLP 65, § 72 + fn. 1; for a closer interpretation of this idea, see Lenzen (2004c)).

Note, incidentally, that IND 1 might be simplified by requiring that, for each concept Y, A either contains Y or contains ~Y:

IND 2             Ind(A) ↔ ∀Y(A∈~Y ↔ A∉Y).

As a corollary it follows that the invalid principle

NEG 9*          A∉B → A∈~B,

which Leibniz again and again had considered as valid, in fact holds only for individual concepts:

NEG 9            Ind(A) → (A∉B → A∈~B).

Already in the “Calculi Universalis Investigationes” of 1679, Leibniz had pointed out:

…If two propositions are given with exactly the same singular [!] subject, where the predicate of the one is contradictory to the predicate of the other, then necessarily one proposition is true and the other is false. But I say: exactly the same [singular] subject, for example, ‘This gold is a metal’, ‘This gold is a not-metal.’ (AE VI, 4, 217-218).

The crucial issue here is that NEG 9* holds only for an individual concept like, for example, ‘Apostle Peter’, but not for general concepts as, for example, ‘man’. The text-critical apparatus of AE reveals that Leibniz was somewhat diffident about this decisive point. He began to illustrate the above rule by the correct example “if I say ‘Apostle Peter was a Roman bishop’, and ‘Apostle Peter was not a Roman bishop’” and then went on, erroneously, to generalize this law for arbitrary terms: “or if I say ‘Every man is learned’ ‘Every man is not learned’.” Finally he noticed this error “Here it becomes evident that I am mistaken, for this rule is not valid.” The long story of Leibniz’s cardinal mistake of mixing up ‘A isn’t B’ and ‘A is not-B’ is analyzed in detail in Lenzen (1986).

There are many different ways to represent the categorical forms by formulas of L1 or L2. The most straightforward formalization would be the following "homogenous" schema in terms of conceptual containment:

UA   A∈B                                    UN   A∈~B

PA   A∉~B                                  PN   A∉B.

The "homogeneity" consists in two facts:

(a)   The formula for the UN is obtained from that of the UA by replacing the predicate B with its negation, ~B. This is the formal counterpart of the traditional principle of obversion according to which, for example, ‘No A is B’ is equivalent to ‘Every A is not-B’.

(b)  In accordance with the traditional laws of opposition, the formulas for the particular propositions are just taken as the negations of corresponding universal propositions.

In view of DEF 2, the first schema may be transformed into

UA   A = AB                                UN   A = A~B

PA   A ≠ A~B                               PN   A ≠ AB.

Similarly, by means of the fundamental law POSS 2, one obtains

UA   ¬P(A~B)                              UN   ¬P(AB)

PA   P(AB)                                   PN   P(A~B).

Furthermore, with the help of indefinite concepts, one can formulate, for example,

UA   ∃Y(A = YB)                          UN   ∃Y(A = Y~B)

PA   ∀Y(A ≠ Y~B)                        PN   ∀Y(A ≠ YB).

Leibniz used to work with various elements of these representations, often combining them into complicated inhomogeneous schemata such as:

“A = YB           is the UA, where the adjunct Y is like an additional unknown term: ‘Every man’ is the same as ‘A certain animal’.

YA = ZB           is the PA. ‘Some man’ or ‘Man of a certain kind’ is the same as ‘A certain learned’.

A = Y not-B      [is the UN] No man is a stone, that is, Every man is a not-stone, that is, ‘Man’ and ‘A certain not-stone’ coincide.

YA = Z not-B    [is the PN] A certain man isn’t learned or is not-learned, that is, ‘A certain man’ and ‘A certain not-learned’ coincide” (Cout, 233-234).

But the representations of PA and PN of this schema are inadequate because the formulas ‘[∃Y∃Z](YA = ZB)’ and ‘[∃Y∃Z](YA = Z~B)’ are theorems of L2! These conditions may, however, easily be corrected by adding the require­ment that YA is self-consistent:

UA   ∃Y(A = YB)                                  UN   ∃Y(A = Y~B)

PA   ∃Y∃Z(P(YA) ∧ YA = ZB)        PN   ∃Y∃Z(P(YA) ∧ YA = Z~B).

Already in the paper “De Formae Logicae Comprobatione per Linearum ductus”, Leibniz had made numerous attempts to prove the basic laws of syllogistic with the help of these schemata. He continued these efforts in two interesting fragments of August 1690 dealing with “The Primary Bases of a Logical Calculus” (LLP, 90 – 92 + 93-94; compare also the closely related essays “Principia Calculi rationalis” in Cout, 229-231 and the untitled fragments Cout, 259-261 + 261-264). In the end, however, Leibniz remained unsatisfied with his attempts.

To be sure, a complete proof of the theory of the syllogism could easily be obtained by drawing upon the full list of "axioms" for L1 and L2 as stated above. But Leibniz more ambitiously tried to find proofs which presuppose only a small number of "self-evident" laws for identity. In particular, he was not willing to adopt principle

(17) Not-B = not-B not-(AB), that is, Not-B contains Not-AB, or Not-B is not-AB

as a fundamental axiom which therefore needs not itself be demonstrated. Although Leibniz realized that (17) is equivalent to the law of contraposition repeated in the subsequent §

(19) ‘A = AB’ and ‘Not-B = Not-B Not-A’ are equivalent. This is conversion by contraposition (Cout, 422),

he still thought it necessary to prove this "axiom": “This remains to be demonstrated in our calculus”!

c. The Plus-Minus-Calculus

The so-called Plus-Minus-Calculus was mainly developed in the paper “Non inelegans specimen demonstrandi in abstractis” of around 1686/7 (compare GP 7, ## XIX, XX and the text-critical edition in AE VI, 4, ## 177, 178; English translations are provided in LLP, 122-130 + 131-144). Strictly speaking, the Plus-Minus-Calculus is not a logical calculus but rather a much more general calculus which admits of different applications and interpretations. In its abstract form, it should be regarded as a theory of set-theoretical containment, set-theoretical "addition", and set-theoretical "subtraction". Unlike modern systems of set-theory, however, Leibniz’s calculus has no counterpart of the relation ‘x is an element of A’; and it also lacks the operator of set-theoretical "negation", that is, set-theoretical complement! The complement of set A might, though, be defined with the help of the subtraction operator as (U-A) where the constant ‘U’ designates the universe of discourse. But, in Leibniz’s calculus, this additional logical element is lacking.

Leibniz’s drafts exhibit certain inconsistencies which result from the experi­mental character of developing the laws for "real" addition and subtraction in close analogy to the laws of arithmetical addition and subtraction. The genesis of this idea is described in detail in Lenzen (1989). The incon­sistencies might be removed basically in two ways. First, one might restrict A-B to the case where B is contained in A; such a conservative reconstruction of the Plus-Minus-Calculus has been developed in Dürr (1930). The second, more rewarding alternative consists in admitting the operation of "real subtraction" A-B also if B is not contained in A. In any case, however, one has to give up Leibniz’s idea that subtraction might yield "privative" entities which are "less than nothing".

In the following reconstruction, Leibniz’s symbols ‘+’ for the addition (that is, union) and ‘-’ for the subtraction of sets are adopted, while his informal expressions ‘Nothing’ (“nihil”) and ‘is in’ (“est in”) are replaced by the modern symbols ‘∅’ and ‘⊆’. Set-theoretical identity may be treated either as a primitive or as a defined operator. In the former case, inclusion can be defined either by A⊆B =df ∃Y(A+Y = B) or simpler as A⊆B =df (A+B = B). If, conversely, inclusion is taken as primitive, identity can be defined as mutual inclusion: A=B =df (A⊆B) ∧ (B⊆A) (see, for example, Definition 3, Propositions 13 +14 and Proposition 17 in LLP, 131-144).

Set-theoretical addition is symmetric, or, as Leibniz puts it, “transposition makes no difference here” (LLP, 132):

PLUS 1           A+B = B+A.

The main difference between arithmetical addition and "real addition" is that the addition of one and the same "real" thing (or set of things) doesn’t yield anything new:

PLUS 2           A+A = A.

As Leibniz puts it (LLP, 132): “A+A = A […] that is, repetition changes nothing. (For although four coins and another four coins are eight coins, four coins and the same four already counted are not)”.

The "real nothing", that is, the empty set ∅, is characterized as follows: “It does not matter whether Nothing is put or not, that is, A+Nih. = A” (Cout, 267):

NIHIL 1           A+∅ = A.

In view of the relation (A⊆B) ↔ (A+B = B), this law can be transformed into:

NIHIL 2           ∅⊆A.

"Real" subtraction may be regarded as the converse operation of addition: “If the same is put and taken away [...] it coincides with Nothing. That is, A [...] - A [...] = N” (LLP, 124, Axiom 2):

MINUS 1         A-A = ∅.

Leibniz also considered the following principles which in a stronger form express that negation is the converse of addition:

MINUS 2*       (A+B)-B = A

MINUS 3*       (A+B) = C → C-B = A.

But he soon recognized that these laws do not hold in general but only in the special case where the sets A and B are “uncommunicating” (Cout, 267, # 29: “Therefore if A+B = C, then A = C-B […] but it is necessary that A and B have nothing in common”.) The new operator of “communicating” sets has to be understood as follows:

If some term, M, is in A, and the same term is in B, this term is said to be ‘common’ to them, and they will be said to be ‘communicating’. (LLP, 123, Definition 4)

Hence two sets A and B have something in common if and only if there exists some set Y such that Y⊆A and Y⊆B. Now since, trivially, the empty set is included in every set A (NIHIL 2), one has to add the qualification that Y is not empty:

COMMON 1     Com(A,B) ↔df ∃Y(Y≠∅ ∧ Y⊆A ∧ Y⊆B).

The necessary restriction of MINUS 2* and MINUS 3* can then be formalized as follows:

MINUS 2         ¬Com(A,B) → ((A+B)-B = A)

MINUS 3         ¬Com(A,B) ∧ (A+B = C) → (C-B = A).

Similarly, Leibniz recognized (LLP, 130) that from an equation A+B = A+C, A may be subtracted on both sides provided that C is “uncommunicating” both with A and with B, that is,

MINUS 4         ¬Com(A,B) ∧ ¬Com(A,C) → (A+B = A+C → B=C).

Furthermore Leibniz discovered that the implication in MINUS 2 may be converted (and hence strengthened into a biconditional). Thus one obtains the following criterion: Two sets A, B are “uncommunicating” if and only if the result of first adding and then subtracting B coincides with A. Inserting negations on both sides of this equivalence one obtains:

COMMON 2     Com(A,B) ↔ ((A+B)-B) ≠ A.

Whenever two sets A, B are communicating or “have something in common”, the intersection of A and B, in modern symbols A∩B, is not empty (LLP, 127, Case 2 of Theorem IX: “Let us assume meanwhile that E is everything which A and G have in common – if they have something in common, so that if they have nothing in common, E = Nothing”), that is,

COMMON 3     Com(A,B) ↔ A∩B ≠ ∅.

Furthermore, “What has been subtracted and the remainder are un­communicating” (LLP, 128, Theorem X), that is,

COMMON 4     ¬Com(A-B,B).

Leibniz further discovered the following formula which allows one to "calculate" the intersection or “commune” of A and B by a series of additions and subtractions: A∩B = B-((A+B)-A). In a small fragment (Cout, 250) he explained:

Suppose you have A and B and you want to know if there exists some M which is in both of them. Solution: combine those two into one, A+B, which shall be called L […] and from L one of the constituents, A, shall be subtracted […] let the rest be N; then, if N coincides with the other constituent, B, they have nothing in common. But if they do not coincide, they have something in common which can be found by subtracting the rest N [...] from B […] and there remains M, the commune of A and B, which was looked for.

4. Leibniz’s Calculus of Strict Implication

It is a characteristic feature of Leibniz’s logic that when he states and proves the laws of concept logic, he takes the requisite rules and laws of propositional logic for granted. Once the former have been established, however, the latter can be obtained from the former by observing a strict analogy between concepts and propositions which allows one to re-interpret the conceptual connectives as propositional connectives. Note, incidentally, that in the 19th century George Boole in roughly the same way first presupposed propositional logic to develop his algebra of sets, and only afterwards derived the propositional calculus out of the set-theoretical calculus. While Boole thus arrived at the classical, two-valued propositional calculus, Leibniz’s approach instead yields a modal logic of strict implication.

Leibniz outlined a simple, ingenious method to transform the algebra of concepts into an algebra of propositions. Already in the “Notationes Generales” written between 1683 and 1685 (AE VI, 4, # 131), he pointed out to the parallel between the containment relation among concepts and the implication relation among propositions. Just as the simple proposition ‘A is B’ is true, “when the predicate [A] is contained in the subject” B, so a conditional proposition ‘If A is B, then C is D’ is true, “when the consequent is contained in the antecedent” (AE VI, 4, 551). In later works Leibniz compressed this idea into formulations such as “a proposition is true whose predicate is contained in the subject or more generally whose consequent is contained in the antecedent” (Cout, 401). The most detailed explanation of this idea was given in §§ 75, 137 and 189 of the GI:

If, as I hope, I can conceive all propositions as terms, and hypotheticals as categoricals and if I can treat all propositions universally, this promises a wonderful ease in my symbolism and analysis of concepts, and will be a discovery of the greatest importance […]

We have, then, discovered many secrets of great importance for the analysis of all our thoughts and for the discovery and proof of truths. We have discovered [...] how absolute and hypothetical truths have one and the same laws and are contained in the same general theorems […]

Our principles, therefore, will be these [...] Sixth, whatever is said of a term which contains a term can also be said of a proposition from which another proposition follows (LLP, 66, 78, and 85).

To conceive all propositions in analogy to concepts means in particular that the conditional ‘If a then b’ will be logically treated like the containment relation between concepts, ‘A contains B’. Furthermore, as Leibniz explained elsewhere, negations and conjunctions of propositions are to be conceived just as negations and conjunctions of concepts. Thus one obtains the following mapping of the primitive formulas of the algebra of concepts into formulas of the algebra of propositions:

A∈B              α → β

A=B               α ↔ β

~A                 ¬α

AB                 α∧β

P(A)              ◊α

As Leibniz himself explained, the fundamental law POSS 2 does not only hold for the containment-relation between concepts but also for the entailment relation between propositions:

‘A contains B’ is a true proposition if ‘A non-B’ entails a contradiction. This applies both to categorical and to hypothetical propositions (Cout, 407).

Hence A∈B ↔ ¬P(A~B) may be “translated” into (α→β) ↔ ¬◊(α∧¬β). This formula unmistakably shows that Leibniz’s conditional is not a material but rather a strict implication. As Rescher already noted in (1954: 10), Leibniz’s account provides a definition of “entailment in terms of negation, conjunction, and the notion of possibility”, which coincides with the modern definition of strict implication put forward, for example, in Lewis & Langford (1932: 124): “The relation of strict implication can be defined in terms of negation, possibility, and product [...] Thus ‘p implies q’ [...] is to mean ‘It is false that it is possible that p should be true and q false’”. This definition is almost identical with Leibniz’s explanation in “Analysis Particularum”: “Thus if I say ‘If L is true it follows that M is true’, this means that one cannot suppose at the same time that L is true and that M is false” (AE VI, 4, 656).

Given the above “translation”, the basic axioms and theorems of the algebra of concepts can be transformed into the following laws of the algebra of propositions:

IMPL 1            α → α

IMPL 2            (α → β) ∧ (β→γ) → (α→γ)

IMPL 3            (α → β) ↔ (α ↔ α∧β)

CONJ 1          (α → β∧γ) ↔ ((α→β) ∧ (α→γ))

CONJ 2          α∧β → α

CONJ 3          α∧β → β

CONJ 4          α∧α ↔ α

CONJ 5          α∧β ↔ β∧α

NEG 1            ¬¬α ↔ α

NEG 2            ¬(α ↔ ¬α)

NEG 3            (α → β) ↔ (¬β→ ¬α)

NEG 4            ¬α → ¬(α∧β)

NEG 5            ◊α → ((α → β) → ¬(α → ¬β))

NEG 6            (α ∧¬α) → β

POSS 1           (α → β) ∧ ◊α → ◊β

POSS 2           (α → β) ↔ ¬◊(α ∧ ¬β)

POSS 3           ¬◊(α ∧ ¬α)

5. Works on Modal Logic

When people credit Leibniz with having anticipated “Possible-worlds-seman­tics”, they mostly refer to his philosophical writings, in particular to the “Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain” (NE) and to the metaphysical speculations of the “Essais de theodicée” (Theo) of 1710. Leibniz argues there that while there are infinitely many ways how God might have created the world, the real world that God finally decided to create is the best of all possible worlds. As a matter of fact, however, Leibniz has much more to offer than this over-optimistic idea (which was rightly criticized by Voltaire and, for example, in part 2 of chapter 8 of Hume’s “An Enquiry concerning Human Under­standing”). In what follows we briefly consider some of Leibniz’s early logical works where

(1)  the idea that a necessary proposition is true in each possible world (while a possible proposition is true in at least one possible world) is formally elaborated, and where

(2)  the close relation between alethic and deontic modalities is unveiled.

a. Possible-Worlds-Semantics for Alethic Modalities

The fundamental logical relations between necessity, ☐, possibility, ◊, and impossibility can be expressed, for example, by:

NEC 1            ☐(α) ↔ ¬◊(¬α)

NEC 2            ¬◊(α) ↔ ☐(¬α).

These laws were familiar already to logicians long before Leibniz. However, Leibniz "proved" these relations by means of an admirably clear analysis of modal operators in terms of “possible cases”, that is, possible worlds:

Possible is whatever can happen or what is true in some cases

Impossible is whatever cannot happen or what is true        in no […] case

Necessary is whatever cannot not happen or what is true in every […] case

Contingent is whatever can not happen or what is [not] true in some case. (AE VI, 1, 466).

As this quotation shows, Leibniz uses the notion of contingency not in the modern sense of ‘neither necessary nor impossible’ but as the simple negation of ‘necessary’. The quoted analysis of the truth-conditions for modal propositions entails the validity not only of NEC 1, 2, but also of:

NEC 3            ☐α → ◊(α)

NEC 4            ¬◊(α) → ¬(α).

Leibniz "proves" these laws by reducing them to corresponding laws for quantifiers such as: If α is true in each case, then α is true in at least one case. In the “Modalia et Elementa Juris Naturalis” of around 1679, Leibniz mentions NEC 3 and NEC 4 in passing: “Since everything which is necessary is possible, so everything that is impossible is contingent, that is, can fail to happen” (AE IV, 4, 2759). A very elliptic "proof" of these laws was already sketched in the “Elementa juris naturalis” of 1669/70 (AE VI, 1, 469).

It cannot be overlooked, however, that Leibniz’s semi-formal truth conditions, even when combined with his later views on possible worlds, fail to come up to the standards of modern possible worlds semantics, since nothing in Leibniz’s considerations corresponds to an accessibility relation among worlds.

b. Basic Principles of Deontic Logic

As has already been pointed out by Schepers (1972) and Kalinowski (1974), Leibniz saw very clearly that the logical relations between the deontic modalities obligatory, permitted and forbidden exactly mirror the corresponding relations between necessary, possible and impossible, and that therefore all laws and rules of alethic modal logic may be applied to deontic logic as well.

Just like ‘necessary’, ‘contingent’, ‘possible’ and ‘impossible’ are related to each other, so also are ‘obligatory’, ‘not obligatory’, ‘permitted’, and ‘forbidden’ (AE VI, 4, 2762).

This structural analogy goes hand in hand with the important discovery that the deontic notions can be defined by means of the alethic notions plus the additional “logical” constant of a morally perfect man (“vir bonus”). Such a virtuous man is characterized by the requirements that he strictly obeys all laws, always acts in such a way that he does no harm to anybody, and is benevolent to all other people. Given this understanding of a “vir bonus”, Leibniz explains:

Obligatory is what is necessary for the virtuous man as such.

Not obligatory is what is contingent for the virtuous man as such.

Permitted is what is possible for the virtuous man as such.

Forbidden is what is impossible for the virtuous man as such (Grua, 605).

If we express the restriction of the modal operators ☐ and ◊ to the virtuous man by means of a subscript 'v', these definitions can be formalized as follows (where the letter ‘E’ reminding of the German notion ‘erlaubt’ is taken instead of 'P' for 'permitted' in order to avoid confusions with the operator of possibility):

DEON 1          O(α) ↔ ☐v(α)

DEON 2          E(α) ↔ ◊v(α)

DEON 3          F(α) ↔ ¬◊v(α).

Now, as Leibniz mentioned in passing, all that is unconditionally necessary will also be necessary for the virtuous man:

NEC 5             ☐(α) → ☐v(α).

Hence (as was shown in more detail in Lenzen (2005)), Leibniz’s derivation of the fundamental laws for the deontic operators from corresponding laws of the alethic modal operators proceeds in much the same way as the modern reduction of deontic logic to alethic modal logic "rediscovered" almost 300 years after Leibniz by Anderson (1958).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Abbreviations for Leibniz’s works

  • AE       German Academy of Science (ed.), G. W. Leibniz, Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, Series VI, „Philosophische Schriften“, Darmstadt 1930, Berlin 1962 ff.
  • Cout   Louis Couturat (ed.), Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz, Paris (Presses universitaires de France) 1903, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1961.
  • GI      Generales Inquisitiones de Analysi Notionum et Veritatum; first edited in Cout, 356-399; text-critical edition in A, VI 4, 739-788; English trans­lation in LLP, 47-87.
  • GP     C. I. Gerhardt (ed.), Die philosophischen Schriften von G. W. Leibniz, seven volumes Berlin/Halle 1875-90, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1965.
  • Grua   Gaston Grua (ed.), G. W. Leibniz – Textes Inédits, two Volumes, Paris (Presses Universitaires de France) 1948.
  • LH       Eduard Bodemann (ed.), Die Leibniz-Handschriften der Königlichen Öffentlichen Bibliothek zu Hannover, Hannover 1895, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1966.
  • LLP   G. H. R. Parkinson (ed.), Leibniz Logical Papers – A Selection, Oxford (Clarendon Press), 1966.
  • NE      Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain – Par l’Auteur du Système de l’Harmonie Preestablie, in GP 5, 41-509.
  • Theo  Essais de Theodicée sur la Bonté de Dieu, la Liberté de l’Homme et l’Origine du Mal, in GP 6, 21-436.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Anderson, Alan Ross (1958): “A Reduction of Deontic Logic to Alethic Modal Logic”, in Mind LXVII, 100-103.
  • Arnauld, Antoine & Nicole, Pierre (1683) : La Logique ou L’Art de Penser, 5th edition, reprint 1965 Paris (Presses universitaires de France).
  • Burkhardt, Hans (1980): Logik und Semiotik in der Philosophie von Leibniz, München (Philosophia Verlag).
  • Couturat, Louis (1901): La Logique de Leibniz d’après des documents inédits, Paris (Félix Alcan).
  • Dürr, Karl (1930): Neue Beleuchtung einer Theorie von Leibniz - Grundzüge des Logikkalküls, Darmstadt.
  • Euler, Leonhard (1768): Lettres à une princesse d'Allemagne sur quelques sujets de physique et de philosophie, St Petersburg, 1768–1772.
  • Hamilton, William (1861): Lectures on Metaphysics and Logic, ed. by H.L. Mansel & J. Veitch, Edinburgh, London (William Blackwood); reprint Stuttgart Bad Cannstadt 1969.
  • Ishiguro, Hidé (1972): Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language, London (Duckworth).
  • Kalinowski, George (1974): “Un logicien déontique avant la lettre: Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz”, in Archiv für Rechts- und Sozialphilosophie 60, 79-98.
  • Kauppi, Raili (1960): Über die Leibnizsche Logik mit besonderer Berücksichti­gung des Problems der Intension und der Extension, Helsinki (Acta Philosophica Fennica).
  • Kneale, William and Martha (1962): The Development of Logic, Oxford (Clarendon).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1984): “Leibniz und die Boolesche Algebra”, in Studia Leibnitiana 16, 187-203.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1986): “‘Non est’ non est ‘est non’ – Zu Leibnizens Theorie der Negation”, in Studia Leibnitiana 18, 1-37.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1989): “Arithmetical vs. 'Real' Addition – A Case Study of the Relation between Logic, Mathematics, and Metaphysics in Leibniz”, in N. Rescher (ed.), Leibnizian Inquiries – A Group of Essays, Lanham, 149-157.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1990): Das System der Leibnizschen Logik, Berlin (de Gruyter).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004a): Calculus Universalis – Studien zur Logik von G. W. Leibniz, Paderborn (mentis).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004b): “Leibniz’s Logic”, in D. Gabbay & J. Woods (eds.) The Rise of Modern Logic – From Leibniz to Frege (Handbook of the History of Logic, vol. 3), Amsterdam (Elsevier), 1-83.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004c): “Logical Criteria for Individual(concept)s”, in M. Carrara, A. M. Nunziante & G. Tomasi (eds.), Individuals, Minds, and Bodies: Themes from Leibniz, Stuttgart (Steiner), 87-107.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2005): “Leibniz on Alethic and Deontic Modal Logic”. In D. Berlioz & F. Nef (eds.), Leibniz et les Puissances du Langage, Paris (Vrin), 2005, 341-362.
  • Lewis, Clarence I. & Langford, Cooper H. (1932): Symbolic Logic, New York, 21959 (Dover Publications).
  • Liske M.-Th. (1994): "Ist eine reine Inhaltslogik möglich? Zu Leibniz’ Begriffs­theorie", in Studia Leibnitiana XXVI, 31-55.
  • Lukasiewicz, Jan (1951): Aristotle’s Syllogistic – From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic, Oxford (Clarendon Press).
  • Mugnai, Massimo (1992): Leibniz’s Theory of Relations, Stuttgart (Steiner).
  • Poser, Hans (1969): Zur Theorie der Modalbegriffe bei G. W. Leibniz, Wiesbaden (Steiner).
  • Rescher, Nicholas (1954): “Leibniz’s interpretation of his logical calculus”, in Journal of Symbolic Logic 19, 1-13.
  • Rescher, Nicholas (1979): Leibniz – An Introduction to his Philosophy, London (Billing & Sons).
  • Sanchez-Mazas, Miguel (1979): “Simplification de l’arithmétisation leibniti­enne de la syllogistique par l’expression arithmétique de la notion intensionelle du 'non ens'”, in Studia Leibnitiana Sonderheft 8, 46-58.
  • Schepers, Heinrich (1972): “Leibniz‘ Disputationen ‚De Conditionibus‘: An­sätze zu einer juristischen Aussagenlogik” in Studia Leibnitiana Supplementa XV, 1-17.
  • Schupp, Franz (ed.) (1982): G. W. Leibniz, Allgemeine Untersuchungen über die Analyse der Begriffe und Wahrheiten, Hamburg (Meiner).
  • Schupp, Franz (ed.) (2000): G. W. Leibniz, Die Grundlagen des logischen Kalküls, Hamburg (Meiner).
  • Swoyer, Chris (1995): “Leibniz on Intension and Extension”, in Noûs 29, 96-114.
  • Sotirov, Vladimir (1999): “Arithmetizations of Syllogistic à la Leibniz”, in Journal of Applied Non-Classical Logics 9, 387-405.
  • Venn, John (1881): Symbolic Logic, London (MacMillan).

 

Author Information

Wolfgang Lenzen
Email: lenzen@uos.de
University of Osnabrück
Germany

Hugo Grotius (1583—1645)

GrotiusHugo Grotius was a Dutch humanist and jurist whose philosophy of natural law had a major impact on the development of seventeenth century political thought and on the moral theories of the Enlightenment. Valorized by contemporary international theorists as the father of international law, his work on sovereignty, international rights of commerce and the norms of just war continue to inform theories of the international legal order. His major work, De Jure Belli ac Pacis (The Rights of War and Peace), is particularly notable in this respect, as well as Mare Liberum, a doctrine in favor of the freedom of the seas, which is considered an antecedent, inspiration and the backbone of the modern law of the sea.

Grotius was heavily influenced by classical philosophy, most prominently Aristotle and the Stoics, as well as by the contemporary humanist tradition and the late-medieval Scholastics. Caught up in the religious strife of the Reformation, Grotius promoted an irenic vision that would unite and reconcile the Christian Church on the principles of civil religion and toleration. He was well known in his time as much for his poetry and philosophy of religion as for his work on law and politics but is best remembered for his influence on theories of the social contract, natural rights and the laws of war.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Irenicism and Tolerance
    1. Religion and Civil Authority
    2. Relations with Non-Christians
    3. Christian Unity and Peace
  3. Sovereignty and Imperialism
    1. Divisible Sovereignty
    2. Resistance, War and Empire
  4. Natural Right and the Law of Nations
    1. Obligations from Nature and Custom
    2. Just War: Jus ad Bellum
    3. Just War: Jus in Bello
  5. Scholarly Interest in Grotius
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

Huig de Groot, best known by the Latinized name Hugo Grotius, began his life in the commercial town of Delft while, in 1583, the Dutch Republic persevered through a second decade of war for independence from Hapsburg rule and was already positioning itself for ascendancy as an overseas trading power. Born into a family with standing among the city elite and connections to the recently founded University of Leiden, young Hugo would find many opportunities to develop his considerable talents for scholarly pursuits even as a child. His family tutored him in Greek and Latin at an early age, introduced him to classical letters, and brought him up in the disciplines of Reformed faith. So outstanding were his gifts for intellectual work that he was welcomed to enroll at Leiden University at the mere age of eleven. At the university, the boy de Groot became a favored student of some of the most celebrated scholars of the time, discovering his talents in a whole range of subjects in the liberal arts and new sciences. His reputation as a promising young man of letters would open a number of doors for him in the political life of the time, where humanist expertise was a valued asset. The most auspicious of these opportunities came as he was preparing for life beyond the university. In 1598, no less a figure than Jan van Oldenbarnevelt, the Grand Pensionary and most influential personality in Dutch politics, invited Grotius to accompany his delegation to the French court. The embassy, which ultimately failed in its aim to renew the king’s military support against Spain, nonetheless brought Grotius into the fold of high politics and even staked him a reputation with the French court when Henry IV lauded the learned youth as “the miracle of Holland.” The connections he made in France enabled Grotius to extend his stay and earn a Doctor of Laws degree from the University of Orléans before returning to Holland the following year.

Entering into practice as a lawyer in The Hague, Grotius took advantage of chances to hone his rhetorical skills and found time to devote to his diverse scholarly interests. His earliest writings to go into print included several imitations of classical verse and translations of significant works in compass navigation and astronomy, the latter being of keen interest to his friends invested in the burgeoning overseas trade. In 1601, he published a tragedy, Adamus Exul (Adam in Exile), that earned him instant acclaim as a poet; it was a work that John Milton would later study in preparing his Paradise Lost. While Grotius prized these pursuits more highly than the mundane work of a lawyer, he always strove to please his patrons and clients. Indeed, his most lasting contributions to political thought took shape in the course of his professional duties during this period.

In 1604, Grotius was drawn into the sensational controversy over privateering in the Southeast Asian trade. The United Dutch East India Company had been rising quickly as a major player in European overseas commerce, and Grotius shared the view of many of his associates involved in the trade that the Company not only buoyed up the young republic with wealth but also weakened its adversaries by cutting into Iberian dominance of the East Indian routes. Still, acts of piracy by a private concern did not sit well in the public opinion of many citizens and allies. When asked by a friend with Company connections to write a brief justifying a recent and very lucrative seizure of Spanish cargo, Grotius went on to produce not only an ardent defense of the capture but an investigation into the deep principles of law that connected those separated by nation and culture. The resulting manuscript, provisionally titled De Indis (On the Indies), was never published in full until long after Grotius’ death (appearing in 1868 as Commentary on the Laws of Prize and Booty). It was the young jurist’s first systematic work on the problems of international affairs and was in many ways his most philosophically developed. Many of the arguments worked out in the manuscript—that there is a basic law of nature determined by the need to reconcile self-preservation with social life, that the authority to govern and even to punish derive from the rights of natural persons prior to the founding of civil societies, and that claims to jurisdiction over the open seas are invalid—would give direction to his later works.

In fact, the last of these arguments would appear in print in 1609 as the anonymous pamphlet, Mare Liberum (The Free Seas). The pamphlet, which Grotius pulled directly from the text of De Indis, once again served the interests of those in the Dutch political and commercial establishment that were insisting upon the right of access to overseas routes in the ongoing negotiations for a truce with the Spanish. The work argued not only that the Spanish claims to a trading monopoly in the Southeast Asia and elsewhere failed to square with the facts—that these were rights conferred by papal authority or acquired by just conquest—but that there was, in principle, no basis for any monopoly on access to the seas. The freedom of the seas was entailed by the very nature of private property. To privately own a thing requires that one can occupy it, taking it out of the common store, and that one can make full use of it. The sea cannot be contained and is too plentiful for its usefulness to be exhausted by a few; hence, no one can take exclusive ownership of the sea. The seas remain open to all. This question was of great importance in European relations during this period of intense competition between aspiring overseas empires, and Grotius’ work would frame the intense debate to follow. During this time in his early legal career, he penned a number of other manuscripts touching on matters of international relations that, while mostly unpublished, shaped his later work on the subject. The Parellelon Rerumpublicarum (composed 1601-2) explored the concept of ‘good faith’ in dealings with other nations through some flattering comparisons among the customs of the Greek, Roman and Dutch peoples. In his Commentary on Eleven Theses (circa 1602-08), Grotius worked out an understanding of the ruling power of a state—its sovereignty—and its relation to the principles of just war.

Having proved the usefulness of his talents to the ruling elite, Grotius’ star continued to rise. He gained recognition from Prince Maurits of Orange, the executive and military leader of the United Provinces, when in 1607, the prince appointed him as attorney general of the provinces of Holland, Zeeland and West Friesland. It was during this time that he became engaged to be married to a young woman from a distinguished family in Zeeland, Maria van Reigersberch. Her partnership and personal courage would carry the family through a tumultuous life that the young couple could not have expected at the time of their wedding in 1608. Soon thereafter, Maria gave birth to the first of seven children. As his focus shifted from legal practice to public service, Grotius began to put a number of his writings into press. His second celebrated tragedy, The Passion of Christ, came out in 1608, followed by the anonymous Mare Liberum in 1609 and a political history of the old Dutch republic, De Antiquitate Reipublicae Batavicae, in 1610. The historical account provided ideological leverage for the position that Holland had persisted in its republican form of government despite the princely claims of the Hapsburgs. The governing States of Holland commissioned Grotius to write a detailed history of the conflict with Spain, which he submitted in 1612. The States declined, likely due to the delicate truce, to publicize the work, leaving the Annales et Historiae de Rebus Belgicus to rest until his sons brought it out posthumously in 1657. Opportunity for higher office came again when, in 1612, the town council of Rotterdam offered Grotius the mayoral position of Pensionary. The title brought with it a seat in the States of Holland where he would collaborate more closely with his mentor, Oldenbarnevelt, and key players in provincial and national politics.

The political controversy that would end up defining Grotius’ tenure in office began with small rumblings when, in 1608, the professor of theology at the University of Leiden, Jacob Arminius, put forth a doctrine that challenged key features of the reigning Calvinist orthodoxy concerning predestination (see below: Irenicism and Tolerance). Calvinist church officials and divines came out strongly against the preaching of such a view. Though Arminius died the following year, the conflict escalated in a way that pitted the church establishment against the civil authorities over the question of who could rule on such doctrinal disputes. Grotius shared with many in the government of Holland some sympathies with the Arminian view but a desire above all to prevent such matters from disturbing the peace. He had been composing, during this time, a manuscript on the idea that all faiths shared a set of core doctrines, a viewpoint capable of promoting a certain equanimity towards squabbles over the finer points of theology. This was in any case the political attitude Grotius favored, and while he never published the Meletius manuscript, he developed several writings on the role of the state in managing conflicts over religion. The pamphlet, Ordinum Hollandiae et Westfrisiae pietas (1613), defended the ‘piety’ of the governments of Holland and Westfriesland in imposing a policy of toleration that allowed Arminians to preach their dissenting doctrine. Grotius himself had drafted the policy, which failed in its aim of mollifying the factions and, in fact, heightened the conflict between the civil and ecclesiastical authorities. Convinced that the practice of religion was a concern proper to civil magistrates, Grotius set about justifying his views in a longer treatise. De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa Sacra argued that, to avoid a conflict of rights, there must be only one final authority within a state on how religion is to be practiced, that because of its mandate to keep civil peace and form responsible citizens this authority ought to come under the civil power, and that civil magistrates would do well to limit their judgments to the core doctrines Grotius had worked out in Meletius. He developed, though never published, the manuscript of De Imperio as the political conflict continued to escalate during 1614-17. His sympathies with the Arminian theology also grew during this period, and in 1617 he took it upon himself to brush back the charges of heresy with the publication of a theological work, Defensio Fidei Catholicae de Satisfactione Christi adversus Faustum Socinum.

As Grotius was being drawn further into the controversy, it came to consume national politics. The orthodox Calvinists, who were a majority at the national level and now had the backing of Prince Maurits, were demanding a national synod to settle the matter. This set up a standoff between Maurits, the national executive and commander of the armed forces, and Oldenbarnevelt, the most influential figure in the States assembly. Oldenbarnevelt led the elites of Holland, including Grotius, in blocking the synod and managing the dispute at the provincial level. That policy culminated in a decision, when riots broke out in 1617, to authorize local militias to suppress the disorder. Maurits denounced the act as an offense against his military authority, and he seized the opportunity to turn the tide against his political adversaries. At the end of an extended political and military campaign to push the Arminian supporters out of the establishment, he ordered the arrest of Oldenbarnevelt and his key supporters in August 1618. Grotius, with his mentor, was locked up and set for trial. A national synod, the famous Synod of Dort, was scheduled. Though incensed at the military coup d’etat against the sovereign institutions of Holland, Grotius calmly petitioned Maurits and the national States-General to no effect. The trials commenced the following year, and Grotius saw his mentor condemned to death for high treason. On May 18, 1619, his own sentence came down: confiscation of property and life imprisonment.

Although he would strive for the rest of his life to vindicate himself and lift the disgrace of the charges from himself and his family, Grotius entered at the age of thirty-six into his term of imprisonment in the castle Loevestein. The only solace of his confinement was that his family was allowed to reside with him and that on her regular leaves his wife Maria was able to bring back books and papers. The scholar was able to turn his isolation to some greater purpose. In Loevestein, Grotius renewed a number of neglected projects. He wrote, fully in didactic verse, a more systematic treatment of his view that there are essential elements common to all religions and that the doctrines of Christianity were recognizable through reason as the most consistent and highest expression of the common faith. The work, initially composed in Dutch, would serve as the basis for his renowned De Veritate Religionis Christiane (The Truth of the Christian Religion). Through his work in law and legal history, he had conceived the plan of writing a rigorous guidebook on jurisprudence of Holland in the vernacular of the Dutch language. The later publication, in 1631, of Inleidinge to the Hollandsche Rechts-geleerdheid (Introduction the Jurisprudence of Holland) would eventually give his book a status in Dutch law analogous to Blackstone’s Commentaries in the English system. Grotius was convinced that he could achieve the same kind of ordered treatment of the concepts, principles and precedents governing relations at the international level. Closed within the walls of his cell, he reached out for a global view of human affairs and prepared parts of what would become the massive treatise, De Jure Belli ac Pacis (The Rights of War and Peace). At the same time, Grotius was looking beyond the walls of Loevestein with a mind for a more immediate scheme: escape. He knew that he had support in the court of Louis XIII in France, and his hopes for reestablishing himself pointed towards Paris. Maria and the family’s young maid-servant, Elsje van Houwening, hatched the plan for escape. On March 22, 1621, Maria made arrangements for a chest of books to be shipped to the nearby town of Gorcum, then helped her husband into the cramped chest and watched Elsje accompany the guards as they unwittingly delivered their prisoner into the hands of friends. A month later, Grotius was in Paris, separated from his family, exiled from his beloved country, yet free.

The long period Grotius spent in exile saw the publication of his most remembered works. Having secured the support of Louis XIII and being reunited with his family, he prepared several manuscripts that he hoped would restore him to prominence. The Apologeticus, appearing in 1622, was straight to the purpose: it contained a full defense of his conduct as a public official of Holland. Despite his earnest pleas of loyalty and the best efforts of his friends, the States-General spurned his arguments and authorized a bounty on him. He turned his attention to the scholarly projects begun in Loevestein. The treatise on the universal law of nature and nations, divided into three hefty books, grew out of the reflections on the subject he had begun twenty years prior. Its first book developed an account of natural justice, so central to his earlier arguments about the Southeast Asian trade, and laid out a broad framework for judging “controversies of any and every kind, as are likely to arise” (JBP I.I.i)—those among politically sovereign entities, private parties, or rival camps within a state. The lengthy second book provided a grounding for the rights in one’s person, property, and sovereignty (subjects he was revisiting from Mare Liberum and his unpublished commentaries) and a detailed consideration of the ways such rights could be acquired, transferred, lost, and protected by recourse to war. The third book, dramatizing the gap between the prevailing customs of warfare and the demands placed on us by a more humane conscience, considers what responsibilities parties have to all those they impact in wartime and in upholding good faith in efforts to build the peace. Many of the arguments of the work were forged in Grotius’ career as an advocate and public official, though he insists in the Prolegomena to the treatise that his perspective in the work is that of a mathematician, abstracting away from particular facts and controversies of the day. When the first edition of De Jure Belli ac Pacis made its appearance in 1625, its readers would have no shortage of conflicts to which to apply its ideas about war and peace, from the campaigns of conquest and appropriation overseas to the long-raging religious conflicts on the continent that were escalating into what would be the Thirty Years War.

Grotius continued, while in France, to write and visit scholars. His Latin edition of The Truth of Christian Religion came out in 1627. It would become his most widely read and translated work. Despite the unreliability of his pension from King Louis, he turned down some tempting offers to serve as a diplomat for other nations and instead renewed his efforts to rehabilitate his standing in the Netherlands. Upon the death of Prince Maurits, Grotius returned to Holland in 1631 in hopes of finding favor with the new Prince of Orange, Frederick Henry, but an arrest warrant from the States-General forced him to flee and take up refuge in Hamburg. Grotius and his wife remained for more than two years in the city without any great prospects. He set himself to composing a third major tragedy, Sophompaneas (Joseph), which would appear in 1635. By that time, his work on the laws of war had brought opportunity to his doorstep. In 1634, he was called to meet with the Swedish High Chancellor, Oxenstierna, who informed him that the recently slain King Gustavus Adolphus had been a great admirer of De Jure Belli and expressed a desire to bring Grotius into the service of Sweden. A major power, Sweden had risen up as a champion of the Protestant cause in the bloody war that gripped Europe, and Grotius was asked to provide counsel to the young queen and serve as her ambassador to another key power, France. The position required that he renounce his Dutch citizenship in order to declare his loyalty to the Swedish crown. Though he never let go of the hope of returning to his home, he accepted. The de Groot family would once again take up residence in Paris.

As ambassador, Grotius was charged with negotiating the terms of French support for the Protestant alliance. The relations were especially fraught due to the delicate position that the French crown, under the guidance of Cardinal Richelieu, had carved out between its opposition to Hapsburg power and its defense of Catholicism. As France increasingly entered the battle fray, much of Grotius’ duty was directed to the war effort. His scholarly projects from the late 1630s-40s, however, took as their object a long-cherished goal: the reconciliation and peace of the Christian community. He began in 1638 on a scriptural commentary that would deflate Protestant rhetoric charging that the Pope was the Antichrist. That same year he slipped an anonymous treatise through an Amsterdam press defending the lay administration of the Eucharist. He then released two lengthy collections of annotations, one on the New Testament and one on the Old, which emphasized the ethical role of the scriptures over the more divisive questions of theology. Building on the idea of shared core doctrines he had explored in his earlier manuscripts, he frankly promoted his vision for a reconciled faith in an appeal printed in Paris in 1942, Via ad Pacem Ecclesiasticam (The Way to Church Peace). Grotius had great hopes that the time was ripe for this vision, but he was disappointed when his arguments were swallowed up in the same old sectarian vitriol.

Having passed the age of sixty, Grotius met with some relief his recall to Swedish court in 1645. The Queen offered to settle his family in Sweden, but he instead requested a passport so that he could rejoin Maria and pursue opportunities elsewhere. He embarked in August in the midst of a terrible storm that damaged the ship and washed it upon the German coast. The ordeal left him ill and weather-beaten. With the aid of servants, he made it to the town of Rostock where he found a hospice. His condition worsened, and death came on August 28, 1645. Arrangements were made to convey his remains to Delft, where the town of his birth bestowed him with the honor that he could not regain in life by interring his body in the Nieuwe Kerk alongside the most celebrated figures of the republic. Maria resettled in Holland, and their sons set about preparing, from Grotius’ papers, updated editions and previously unpublished manuscripts for the press. De Jure Belli ac Pacis, especially, would come to have enduring influence as the Enlightenment philosophers of the next generations embraced its framework of natural jurisprudence as a model for a modern science of law and morals. His work would become a point of departure for those natural lawyers focusing on the law among nations, from Pufendorf and Barbeyrac to Thomasius and Vattel. It would inspire radical ideas about natural rights and the social contract in the Anglo-American political discourses of Hobbes, Locke, Jefferson and Madison. For the Scottish Enlightenment, it would be required reading, informing the moral theories of Carmichael, Hutcheson, Hume and Smith. As natural jurisprudence gave way to positivism and idealism in 19th-century European thought, the place of Grotius receded in moral and political theory, but his work would be recovered in the context of emerging ideas about the international legal order as the next century approached. His work is most widely known today among those working on international relations and law, though there has been rapidly expanding scholarship on his contributions to political thought, ethics, and the philosophy of religion.

2. Irenicism and Tolerance

In the politics of the Dutch Republic and with regard to the broader religious strife in Europe, Grotius fashioned himself as an irenicist, one who seeks to bring the different denominations of Christianity together. The inflammatory conflicts among the Christian churches, which remained a persistent cause of war and upheaval in the political life of European societies, was in Grotius’ view largely attributable to excesses of dogmatism (see Heering 2004). If dogmatic claims could be reduced to an agreeable set of core tenets, he reasoned, then the various sects would have grounds for cooperating towards a reunified Christian church while allowing more esoteric matters to be contested without posing a threat to peace. This hope for Christian peace and unity characterizes Grotius’ theologically-oriented works from his early Meletius (1611) to Via ad Pacem Ecclesiasticam (1642), among his latest writings at the height of the Thirty Years War.

a. Religion and Civil Authority

In the early decades of the 17th century when Grotius’ was cutting his teeth in Dutch politics, the temperature was rising on a theological dispute concerning salvation and freedom of the will. The reformed churches, which had the backing of the civil authorities, were founded on orthodox Calvinist doctrine. The standard Calvinist view of salvation held that God’s choice of who would be saved preceded the act of creation; this grace was, consequently, not a status that could be earned through good works but rather was predestined. This view was consistent with the dominant Protestant interpretations of scripture and represented a social and ethical worldview that was compelling to the reformed faithful. Yet this view also carried the ethically troubling implication that individual choice makes no difference to how one stands with God and, as the Leiden professor of theology, Jacob Arminius, would argue, did not account for elements of scripture that seemed to acknowledge a role for human will. Arminius maintained that God’s saving grace was on offer to anyone while still accepting the basic Calvinist premise that, prior to any human act, God had already determined who He would actually elect to everlasting happiness. The paradox could be resolved by recognizing that God’s grace might be resisted. This elegant solution enabled Arminius to account for freedom of the human will while retaining the key Protestant tenet that grace alone, not works, qualifies the elect. The Arminian view of salvation, to draw on Richard Tuck’s illuminating analogy, understands God’s offer of grace to the elect to be much like a parent’s offer to buy something for a child: “the child can refuse the offer, but he cannot purchase the present himself” (Tuck 1993 p. 182). While representing a significant revision to orthodox Calvinism, this view remained consistent with the larger doctrine.

The political question, however, was whether adherents of the Arminian position should be allowed to teach it within the publically established churches. Grotius’ writings from this period confront both the theological and political aspects of the debate. On the question of theology his sympathies laid with Arminius, and his defenses of the view led up to the publication of the substantial De Satisfactione (published in 1617), which distinguished many of the Arminian tenets from the ‘Socianian’ heresies charged by the view’s opponents. Politically, the Arminian preachers were seeking a policy of toleration within the public churches. Grotius and others aligned with Oldenbarnevelt recognized the advantages of such a policy for preserving quiet in the republic. Characteristically, Grotius saw the policy as rooted in philosophical concerns. As early as the (unpublished) manuscript Meletius (1611), he was developing a philosophy of religion according to which all faiths shared core beliefs about the nature of divinity and its role in human life. While this view stressed commonality, it did not entail pluralism. A religious tradition may possess a stronger claim to truth than others in virtue of its consistency with the central doctrines and the credibility of its supporting testimony; for Grotius, Christianity held this title. (This defense of Christianity is most fully developed in Grotius’ most widely published and popular work, On the Truth of the Christian Religion.) Yet Christian tradition, too, had a further set of core doctrines which were necessary for proper worship and for the promotion of responsible citizenship. The church could accommodate friendly debate over finer matters of theology as long as it was firmly rooted in the necessary articles of faith. This philosophical framework, while not made fully public at the time, undergirded Grotius’ advocacy of the toleration policy, which the States of Holland would eventually adopt.

The policy, Grotius well understood, required not only justification but also legitimacy: in defining acceptable doctrines, the civil authority was asserting itself in sacred matters. Grotius addressed this issue in his 1613 pamphlet defending the toleration policy, Ordinum Hollandiae et Westfrisiae pietas, and went on to develop the argument for the central principles into a major essay on the authority of civil government over the public practice of religion. De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa sacra (1614-17, unpublished) argued that the supreme civil power holds legitimate authority over all matters concerning the public interest, whether sacred or profane. In addition to finding support from scripture and tradition, Grotius grounds his case on the simple Aristotelian argument that, because the commands of multiple authorities would allow for conflicting obligations, there can be only one supreme authority in a jurisdiction (ch. 1). Holding this authority enables the supreme power, then, to preserve civil peace as well as to promote, through the effects of religion, the formation of obedient and upright citizens. The bulk of the work is thus occupied with defending the plausibility of this conclusion by clearing away misconceptions and by reconciling it both with the variety of forms of political and legal organization and with the special calling of the church. To accept the authority of the civil power in religious matters, Grotius argues, does not imply that magistrates are competent to determine the truth of all fine points of theology: a wise ruler will make use of counsel from the most reliable pastors. With even greater wisdom, a ruler would do well to abstain from pronouncing on all but the most essential articles of faith, those that are necessary for salvation (ch. 6, 9). As an instance of an inessential matter in which a “prudent silence” recommends itself, he offers those “questions about the order of predestination and the reconciliation of human free will with grace” (ibid). The policy of the States of Holland, in this framework, was a form of containment: the policy defined the boundaries of permissible doctrine at the point that would endanger the salvation of those who accept it, while allowing the disagreements inside these bounds to play themselves out. Such was Grotius’ recommendation, in both theory and practice. At bottom, however, the policy had its validity not in view of its laudable tolerance but on Erastian grounds. (The citations in the work acknowledge the influence of Thomas Erastus, who a generation earlier had argued for the supreme authority of the state in church governance.) The central position of De imperio was that any policy issued by the civil power would be valid so long as it did not contradict God’s will. That this Erastian position made room for toleration and contributed to civil peace only added to its appeal.

b. Relations with Non-Christians

The principle of toleration guided Grotius’ handling of the Arminian conflict and also served as an ideal in his view of dealings with non-Christians. Among the groups that had found haven in the Netherlands from the Inquisition were Portuguese Jews, and Grotius was asked during his time as a public official to reconsider what ought to be the policy the States towards the presence and worship practices of Jewish communities. His Remonstrantie on the question was of a piece with his developing philosophy of public religion: Jewish worship could be consistent with the state interest in religion, as Judaism accepted the fundamental doctrines regarding God’s existence and concern for human conduct. The policy recommendation was to afford civil liberties and freedom of worship to Jews, under certain restrictions that would serve to “safeguard” the salvation of Christians. This meant, for instance, that Jewish synagogues would not enjoy the same freedom to preach to Christian audiences that could be granted to Arminian and Calvinist disputants, but Grotius maintained that this encumbered status was preferable to the other options in the field. He opposed forcing Jews to practice Christianity on the grounds that such a policy was incoherent, since faith cannot be forced, as well as sinful, since it would induce people to false professions. An alternative was to forbid Jewish worship altogether, but this would promote godlessness, which would be intolerable. Finally, to those who were calling for expulsion, Grotius gave a sustained response partly grounded in principles of natural law: the social bond that nature establishes among humans should not be severed except as punishment for crime. Jewish practice did not transgress natural law, and its faith supported civic life. It was proper, therefore, that Christians and Jews share social arrangements on the basis of common principles of public order and justice.

The same balance between Christian privilege and the potential for peaceful cooperation underwrote Grotius’ approach towards the expanding relationships between Europeans and non-Christian societies around the world. The principles of natural justice in De Jure Belli ac pacis—which grounded claims to sovereignty, property, and the fulfillment of pacts—were valid and binding in any human encounter, requiring no special relation to God. The principles would oblige us, in Grotius’ famous phrase, “even if we should concede (etiamsi daremus) that which cannot be conceded without the utmost wickedness, that there is no God, or that the affairs of men are of no concern to Him” (JBP Prol. 11). Mutual recognition of natural law provided the basis for any two parties to arrive at just and peaceful terms of association, most notably those concerning trade and alliances. This did not imply that all practices regarding religion were consistent with natural law. Because a sense of justice is not sufficient to motivate humans routinely to do right, the broader human society, even more than civil societies, depends upon religion to maintain order and instill reverence for its norms (see JBP Prol. 20 and II.XX.XLIV.6). To reject God involves not only the “utmost wickedness” but a criminal disregard for human society. Indeed, the two tenets that Grotius identifies—that there is a God and that human affairs are of concern to Him—constitute what he takes to be the core of religious belief, found in all societies. Those who oppose these core beliefs may be punished, by war if necessary, but differences among the religious are not, in themselves, grounds for war (JBP II.XX.XLVI-XLVIII). Pagans, polytheists, Jews and Muslims might fail to accept the “truths” of Christianity, but their participation in the common faith supports the basic ethical structure of society. Christianity, even under non-Christian sovereigns, yet has this privilege: that in virtue of its claim to truth, its adherents must not be punished for teaching the Gospel (JBP II.XX.XLIX). The right to suppress religious doctrine, which De imperio claimed for the civil power, extends only to teachings not essential to Christian salvation.

c. Christian Unity and Peace

The privileged status of Christianity among the world’s religions is the subject of The Truth of the Christian Religion. As in De Jure Belli, composed around the same time, Grotius argues that a basic understanding of divinity and its role in the world is accessible through the use of the natural capacity of reason alone. Such truths include not only the existence and providence of God, but also God’s oneness, perfection, causal responsibility for all that happens, and judgment in the afterlife. The proofs Grotius offers are not original but are borrowed from sources both ancient and recent, owning that people of varying sophistication have long been able to reason back to a necessary and singular ‘first cause’ and to grasp that the perfect nature of such a cause would not neglect the good of all creation (ch. 1).  While some of these points require more subtle thought than others, all people can in principle arrive at the conclusions through rational reflection. Christ, however, is known through history. To learn of redemption and of what is required for salvation, one needs access to particular facts about Christ’s coming and His call to the faithful. The relevant facts, still, are supported by reasonable inferences based on reliable testimony (the evangelists), the consensus of historians, and the evidence of miracles performed. This project of deriving religious knowledge through rational investigation is what later philosophers would call “natural religion.” Significantly, Grotius argues that these facts gain further confirmation when one recognizes that the doctrines of Christianity have the greatest intrinsic appeal. The Gospel has this appeal in virtue of the reward it promises (the eternal beatitude of the soul), the quality of its ethical teachings (obeying out of love rather than fear, showing love to neighbors and enemies, and so forth), and the impeccable character of its teacher, Christ (ch. 2). Experience and rational consideration, while sufficient to establish the truth of Christianity, may not convince as readily as inferences from mere reason. Indeed, immediate acceptance is not possible without God’s help. On these grounds, Grotius would argue in De Jure Belli that one may neither punish those who fail to embrace Christianity nor impose belief by force (II.XX.XLVIII). Christians would do better to impress non-believers with their ethical example and offer persuasive arguments for conversion.

To this end, De Veritate provides a detailed debunking of other faiths. While its arguments reveal that Grotius undertook a serious study of non-Christian religions—with the aid of friends such as the Hebrew and Arabic scholar, Thomas Erpenius—some of his characterizations are far from generous, repeating old slurs about Jewish animosity towards Christians and the violent character of Islam. The arguments of the book were, after all, calculated to more than one purpose. Grotius intended the book to be of special use to seamen, whom while off to many corners of the earth to establish Dutch trading interests, would encounter a dazzling diversity of religious belief that might not only elude their attempts at persuasion but also challenge their own faith. It was the Christian reader, most of all, who may need to be assured of the Gospel’s special claim to truth.

The further effect Grotius hoped De Veritate would have on its Christian readers was to impress upon them that, in the range of religious diversity, the similarities among Christians are much more significant than the differences. The irenicist program that Grotius pursued in his later years had two main prongs. The first provided a map for Christian reunification based upon minimal agreement regarding core doctrines, beyond which some difference of belief and practice could be accommodated. The second urged Christians to recognize that the most important lessons to be taken from scripture are its ethical teachings, not its dogmas. This was the simple, practical faith that he saw reflected in the earliest Christian community and in the Christian humanists, like Erasmus, whom he so much admired. It was also a faith of which civil authorities, responsible for civic peace and virtue, could be worthy custodians.

3. Sovereignty and Imperialism

Connecting the political and international thought of Grotius is his conception of sovereignty, the supreme right of governing (summum imperium). The mark of the sovereign power is that it “cannot be made void by any other human will” (JBP, I.III.viii). Within a state, it is the highest authority; internationally it encounters other sovereign powers, among whom none holds a superior right.

a. Divisible Sovereignty

The guiding idea in Grotius’ treatment of sovereignty, as with his treatment of rights generally, is that systems of rights are radically alterable through the ways people choose to dispose of those rights. As a result, societies will vary widely in how they organize the powers of sovereignty. Philosophers might argue for the advantages of one scheme or another, “but as there are several ways of living, some better than others, and every one may choose which he pleases of all those sorts; so a people may choose what form of government they please: neither is the right which the sovereign has over his subjects to be measured by this or that form, of which divers men have divers opinions, but by the extent of the will of those who conferred it upon him” (JBP I.III.viii). What justifies a scheme of rights is that it has arisen from the historical choices of their legitimate holders, not any features of its form. This principle gave Grotius a great deal of flexibility in defending different political arrangements, provided the facts of history for the given society would play along.

On one side, Grotius was able to argue against royalists who sought to define sovereignty as an indivisible package of prerogatives that could be vested in only a singular will. Grotius takes this claim, which Jean Bodin had advanced a generation earlier, at face value but treats indivisibility as a purely conceptual point: to institute civil power in a society consists in gathering up a certain package of governmental rights and in designating who will hold that power supremely. The rights of governing come as a package, but a society may, if it chooses, designate different holders for the various rights.

Grotius developed this position early in his career in an unpublished manuscript that he called Commentary in Eleven Theses. The practical divisibility of sovereignty is an indispensable premise for the political argument of the work, which defends the ongoing Dutch war against the rule of the king of Spain. Unlike earlier apologists, Grotius does not conceive of the war as a revolt based on right of a people to resist a tyrannical ruler but rather as a war between sovereign powers (see Borschberg 1994 pp. 169ff. and Keene 2002 pp. 45ff.). If one studies the history of rights in the Dutch case, Grotius argues, one finds that the Dutch people did not transfer all governing rights to a prince bur reserved some, in particular the right to levy taxes, to the States of Holland. While holding supreme power on many matters, the Spanish king had sought to usurp a further supreme power from the States, an act which provided them a just cause to wage war in defense of its right. Put in the language of sovereignty, the king possessed no right to render void the will of the States when it came to taxation, just as this particular right of the States could not render void the king’s rights in other matters: each was supreme within the scope of its own authority (cf. JBP I.IV.xiii). Grotius retained and systematized this conception of divisible sovereignty in De Jure Belli, where he also considered the criticism that such arrangements based on divided powers were recipes for civil strife. His answer insists on the principle with which he began: while one can point to inconveniences in any arrangements, the only relevant question in matters of right is whether those arrangements were the ones chosen (I.III.xvii).

On the other side of the political spectrum, Grotius argued against theories of popular sovereignty. The position of constitutionalist thinkers, such as those among the reforming Huguenots who would come to be called ‘monarchomachs,’ was that the right of kings to rule derives from the rights of the people; since some of these rights are inalienable, the representatives of the people retain a right to resist a regime that tyrannically usurps these rights. Grotius’ response was to grant that rights originate from the people but to argue that the people can choose to alienate whatever rights they wish, even up to the extreme of enslaving themselves to another (JBP, I.III.viii). Utter subjection to an absolute monarch is, therefore, entirely possible and consistent with the history of political arrangements in many societies. Grotius’ flexible approach enabled him to defend the republican principles alive in the Dutch provinces from one side of his mouth while shoring up the absolutist claims of his later patrons from the other. In his defense of the latter claims, we find Grotius even paying homage to the time-worn doctrine of Aristotle that some people are naturally suited to be slaves. Importantly, Grotius does not admit the doctrine as grounds for imposing slavery but rather repurposes it: the doctrine can explain why a people might choose of their own accord to hand over their full rights to the more prudent government of another. Ineptitude at self-rule, it turns out, is just one of many considerations that might factor into the selection of a form of government.

b. Resistance, War and Empire

Grotius’ understanding of sovereignty carries several implications for his theory of just war. The first concerns his position on the “right of resistance,” the hotly contested question of whether a subject people may ever justly depose a ruler for misgovernment. While Grotius rejects constitutionalist arguments that reserve inalienable rights to the people, he finds a way to preserve this rationale for resistance in a more limited form. It is unlikely that most civil societies would have been founded on utter subjection. In the absence of clear evidence that subjects have completely alienated their rights, one has to presume that rational people would have preserved their most basic rights against arbitrary treatment. This presumption attaches only in cases of “extreme necessity,” as when a government turns its sword on innocent subjects, and then only when resistance could be carried out without creating an even bloodier civil conflict (I.VI.vii). When Grotius invokes this argument from extreme necessity, he relies on what Richard Tuck has called a kind of interpretive charity (1979 pp. 79-80): since civil authority is a human institution, the bounds of which are derived from the wills of those who established it, one must credit the founders with intentions that would rationally advance, not undermine, the aims of civil association. (Compare the parallel reasoning in limiting the rights of property, II.II.vi.) Second, Grotius assigns a role in this context to third-party humanitarian intervention. Even if it should turn out that subjects must bear the most arbitrary assaults from their proper sovereign, a third-party would remain free from the special obligations that constrain subjects from resisting and could intervene on their behalf. Such interventions should only be attempted when it is evident that a government is committing gross injustices against its people—“such Tyrannies over subjects, as no good Man living can approve” (JBP II.XXV.viii). The third implication concerns Grotius’ complicated relation to imperialism. In defending the legitimacy of diverse forms of political authority, he is rejecting the principle behind those forms of imperialism that seek to impose a more enlightened form of rule for the good of the governed. Elsewhere in De Jure Belli he explicitly refutes the argument that slavery can be imposed on those who might be naturally suited to it (II.XXII.xii) and castigates those who claim rights of ‘discovery’ over lands already occupied by supposedly less enlightened folk (II.XXII.ix). On these points, he is in agreement with earlier critics of the Spanish conquests such as Francisco de Vitoria and Bartolome de las Casas.

The strategies of commercial imperialism, which characterized Dutch practice, found much more support in Grotius’ theory of just war (see generally, Tuck 1999 ch. 3, van Ittersum 2006, Wilson 2008, Thomson 2009). The whole concern of De Jure Belli is how to justly settle controversies in the dealings of those who do not live under a shared system of civil laws. In the context of global trade, such dealings will involve the claims of private parties as well as the contentions of kings and states. It ultimately falls to each party, when operating outside the jurisdiction of a common court, to judge the controversy based on the applicable standards of natural, customary, state and divine law. Significantly, Grotius maintains that such relations can be peaceful so long as those involved have a clear understanding of the law and hold themselves to norms of justice, equity, temperance, and humanity. Yet, just as magistrates duly back their rulings with force, those involved in a dispute have the right to redress injuries by means of war. Used rightly, De Jure Belli would provide all parties with a clear understanding of how the law applied to various disputes and educate them in how to render fair and responsible verdicts. However, used rightly, it would also give trading powers the flexibility to leverage their arrangements with non-Europeans and the justifications to uphold these arrangements with force. One stratagem it enabled was encroachment on local sovereignty (see Keene 2002 pp. 48ff and 79ff). Grotius’ position was firmly that non-Christian rulers could hold full title to sovereignty, but his view of sovereignty was that its marks could be divided up among various holders. A foreign trading power might enter into an alliance with a ruler that required him, for instance, to provide land for a trading ‘factory’ or deliver up his people’s labor. These arrangements do not, in themselves, transfer any mark of sovereignty, but Grotius argues that, if the foreign power (unjustly) usurps this right over time without being challenged, its “long possession” provides it with a claim to sovereignty that is now just (JBP I.III.XXI.10-11). Because marks of sovereignty can be divided off in this way, the foreign power can take over limited rights of its own without being guilty of usurping the broader authority of the king. Once the limited right was established, however, it could also be protected with force should the king try to reconsolidate his power (by the same right that the Dutch defended their limited sovereignty against the ambitions of their Spanish overlord). Had the rulers of Southeast Asia read Grotius’ work, they might have found a useful warning about the risks of getting entangled with a powerful ally; the readers among the European mercantile class would also see its usefulness.

The natural-right framework of De Jure Belli also empowers parties to a contract to arrive at their own judgments about how to interpret indeterminate clauses (JBP II.XVI) and authorizes any party, public or private, to execute punishment for culpable violations of the law (II.XX). The idea that war-making can be understood as an extension of the right to punish had been part of the Christian just-war tradition from Augustine through Vitoria and Suarez, but Grotius reconceives punishment as a natural right that obtains prior to civil authority (see Tuck 1999 pp. 102f. and Straumann 2006). In circumstances beyond civil jurisdiction, law-respecting persons can take it upon themselves to police and punish crimes affecting society. Because this exercise of power over another assumes a position of superiority, Grotius recognizes the need to explain how this difference in standing can arise among those who are equal by nature. His solution is to point out that violators demote themselves beneath the rest of humanity (JBP II.XX.iii). Anyone who remains in this position of moral superiority can properly execute punishment. The natural right to punish was an important innovation in Grotius’ early De Indis, where he argued that Dutch merchants had legitimate authority to punish the Portuguese for monopolizing the seas (fol. 40). It remains a key feature of his theory of punishment in De Jure Belli, where it provides a further source for just causes to resort to war. In contrast to the anti-imperialist arguments of Vitoria and the school of Salamanca, which had maintained that the princes of Europe had no authority to punish those beyond their jurisdiction except in response to ‘an injury received’ (On the Law of War q.1 a.3; see also On the American Indians q. 2 a.5), Grotius opens the door to punitive war against those who commit ‘crimes against nature.’ Elevated as moral superiors above regimes that enjoin or condone manifestly unjust practices—including cannibalism, piracy, the oppression of their own people or the cruel treatment of foreigners—outside powers may seek to punish these regimes in the interests of human society (II.XX.XL). Adopted while Grotius still had ties to the interests of the Dutch trading companies, this interventionist stance would have expanded the range of justifications available for colonizing lands in both Asia and the Americas (see Tuck 1999 pp. 103-4 and van Ittersum 2010).

At the same time, Grotius shows an awareness, and some discomfort, that his position could be used as a pretext for expansionist wars. He cautions that only violations of universal norms, not of the evolving customs of Europe, count as punishable offenses. Quoting Plutarch, he explicitly warns of the lurking temptations of imperialism: “To wish to impose civilization upon uncivilized peoples is a pretext which may serve to conceal greed for what is another’s” (II.XX.XLI). The structure of Grotius’ position, characteristic of the framework of De Jure Belli, both insists on strict adherence to norms of justice, equity and humanity while still affording the powerful the flexibility to interpret, judge and enforce those norms by their own lights.

4. Natural Right and the Law of Nations

The broadest principles of just war in De Jure Belli ac pacis derive from two sources: the norms of natural justice and the customary law of nations (ius gentium). (Other human and divine laws, importantly, also lay down binding principles for those who have received them, but these sources do not have the universal character of the laws of nature and nations.) On any given question regarding the resort to war or its conduct, both systems of law must be consulted, as each system is capable of influencing the rights and obligations of the other.

a. Obligations from Nature and Custom

The account of natural law in De Jure Belli, heavily influenced by the Stoic notions of Cicero, begins from two universal human concerns: self-preservation and social connection (see JBP I.II.I and Prol. 6-8). The rights of obligations of natural law are all justified in terms of the rational balancing of these two primary concerns. This approach is an outgrowth of Grotius’ earliest work on the laws of war, De Indis, where he argued that the imperative of self-preservation justified two permissions of natural law: to defend one’s life and to acquire possessions (fol. 5’-6). The need for human fellowship justifies two basic obligations towards others: to refrain from inflicting injury and from seizing their possessions (fol. 6’-7’). One apparent change that Grotius makes to his earlier theory regards the basis for these obligations. In De Indis, he aligns himself with a voluntarist account of obligation, found in medieval thinkers such as Ockham, which maintains that natural law is binding upon humans in virtue of the divine will that commands it (fol 5’). The design of nature is one way in which we receive God’s commands. By the time of De Jure Belli, Grotius seems to accept the alternative, intellectualist position that natural law binds us by teaching what both humans and God can recognize as necessary for human life: it shows us not what is obligatory because commanded but what is obligatory or permissible “in itself” (JBP I.I.x). In fact, there is much ambiguity in the later work as to which position Grotius accepts, showing itself even in his very definition of natural law as “a dictate of right reason, which points out that an act has in it a quality of moral baseness of moral necessity; and that, in consequence, such an act is either forbidden or enjoined by the author of nature, God” (JBP I.I.x). This definition is perhaps closest to the ‘mediating’ position more recently advanced by Suárez, maintaining that intellect could recognize what is, in itself, good or bad for humans but that only God’s command makes it obligatory to live accordingly (De Legibus II.VI; see Schneewind 1998 pp. 61 and 74).

What is clear is that Grotius draws a basic distinction in law, following Aristotle, between obligations derived from nature and those derived from an authoritative will (JBP I.I.ix and xiii-xvi). Sources of this second, ‘volitional’ type of law can be divine (as revealed in scripture) or human, and the latter includes not only the laws of particular states but also those laws that nations accept in their relations with each other. Kings and peoples give their assent to the law of nations through custom, not typically by positive agreement. Long observance of a norm in the relations between states gives it the force of law. In contrast to natural law, which confers its basic rights and obligations to all persons whether in a private or public capacity, the law of nations applies to relations between sovereign entities (cf. JBP Prol. 40; De Indis fol. 12ff). It deals, accordingly, largely with matters of state, such as embassies, treaties, and the special privileges of sovereigns in waging war. This system of customary law, in turns out, makes the legal position of sovereigns radically different from that of private actors in the ‘universal society’ established by natural law.

b. Just War: Jus ad Bellum

The mutual influence of the laws of nature and nations can be seen in both the resort to war (traditionally called the jus ad bellum) and in its conduct (jus in bello). The only just grounds for resorting to war are those that involve the pursuit of a right. Among such pursuits, Grotius identifies three kinds: self-defense, the recovery of property and punishment. Each of these has its basis in natural law, though the particular rights at issue might arise from other sources, such as the law of nations. The right of self-defense arises from the natural permission every person has to protect against injury (II.I.iii). If our primary concern is self-preservation, we could not take the risk of living among other people without reserving the permission to protect ourselves from them. The right of defense extends not only to one’s life, but also to one’s body and property. Grotius argues that killing in defense of one’s body is justifiable even if the assailant’s objective is not to kill but to maim or rape (II.I.vi-vii). The reason is that one can never trust that a physical assault will not result in death (though it is unclear in Grotius’ treatment of rape whether it is the victim’s life or interests of men in her ‘chastity’ that is the justifying concern). There are two constraints on justified self-defense: that the attack is imminent and certain (II.I.v). Defense is a just cause that applies only to immediate danger. Even property, however, may be defended with lethal force, with the further constraint that such force is necessary for retaining it (II.I.xvi).

Apart from defense, war may be waged in order to recover one’s rights or to punish the offender. Acting under these just causes will often entail being the one to initiate violence. Grotius argues that this breach of peace is not anti-social (and hence in violation of natural justice) because the initiator is only demanding what the other party already owes (I.II.i.5-6) – they are not violating but upholding the system of rights. Recovery of property applies not only to moveable things and territory, but also to rights over persons (such as rightful subjects or slaves), rights to actions (such as the fulfillment of contracts), and compensation for damages. All of these might be claimed by natural right, though the particular claims might be shaped by prevailing domestic systems of property or by the law of nations. This single heading yields an expansive range of cases in which war is a just option for enforcing rights. Punishment multiplies such cases. When someone willfully violates a right, they become obligated not only to make restitution but to endure punishment equivalent to their crime. Any law-respecting person (as explained above) may execute this punishment, in principle, though a number of factors will tend to limit international punishment. Due to the high risk of harming the innocent in pursuit of the guilty, punitive wars are permissible only for serious crimes (II.XX.xxxviii). In most circumstances, only sovereign governments will be permitted to execute the punishment since individual citizens would have transferred this natural right to their state (see II.XX.xxiv and II.XX.xl; cf. De Indis, fol. 40-40’). Public authorities, therefore, can lay claim to special punitive causes such as the punishment of crimes against natural society (see above) and anticipatory defense. Whereas only an actual attack can justify self-defense, a plot to attack, once set in motion, is already a crime (II.I.xvi). Under the cause of punishment, a state may resort to preemptive warfare which defense alone could not justify. Finally, every exercise of punishment must be limited to the achievement of certain goods. While the right to punish has a retributive justification rooted in the offender’s obligation to endure it, the exercise of this right ought to be governed by consequentialist considerations. The good of the offender, of the victim and of the broader society, are all relevant benefits that need to be weighed against the harms to each of these (II.XX.iv-ix). Especially when the consequences of punishment include a broader war, these considerations may urge clemency, restraint or even pardon (II.XX.xxii-iv and xxxiv-xxxvi; see II.XXIV.ii-iii).

There is a general pattern of argument—that people are permitted, in the strictness of justice, to use violence in a great many cases that will nonetheless call for moderation in the name of humanity and peace—that characterizes the whole of De Jure Belli ac Pacis. Justice is a crucial virtue, as the maintenance of society and respect of law require it, but its guidance is limited to these minimal aims. To know what the laws ought to be and to decide when and how far to exercise one’s rights, it becomes necessary to follow the promptings of equity, humanity and prudence. These “virtues which have as their object the good of others” (I.I.viii) not only serve to measure the proper severity of punishments but also to determine whether war for a punitive cause is warranted at all. Humaneness imposes a moral limit, too, in how far one ought to press rights to property, so as not to use market power to squeeze people (II.XII.xvi) or to withhold vital information when making contracts (II.XII.ix). Even in self-defense, the resort to war can have humanitarian consequences that speak strongly against making full use of one’s right (II.I.iv, viii, ix and xi). It would be a grave error, Grotius warns, to think that “where a right has been adequately established, either war should be waged forthwith, or even that war is permissible in all cases” (II.XXIV.i). The resort to war must be squared not only with justice but with humanitarian concerns, especially for its impact on the lives of innocent people. This loving regard for others that aspires to universality is what Grotius held up, in his works on religion, as the great ethical appeal of the Gospel, and De Jure Belli instructs its readers to recognize that not only humanity but also God calls them to love, forbearance and restraint.

c. Just War: Jus in Bello

The meshing of these normative standards of justice and humanity is especially pronounced in Grotius’ treatment of the conduct of war in Book III of De Jure Belli. The natural law provides but one basic rule for the conduct of war: “things which lead to an end receive their intrinsic value from the end itself” (JBP III.I.ii). That is, if one has a right to resort to war, then one has a right to conduct the war by whatever means are necessary to vindicate the just case. Grotius finds natural justice an unsatisfactory basis for the ethics of combat for two main reasons: (i) it permits inhumane and intemperate actions on the part of those who fight under a just cause, and (ii) it provides no guidance whatsoever for those who fight under an unjust cause. The answer to the first deficiency is Grotius’ account of temperamenta, discussed below. The second deficiency finds its solution in the law of nations. Grotius recognizes that while no war can be naturally just on both sides—a right on one side precludes a right on the other—wars may be either unjust on both sides or justifiably believed to be just on both sides. In either case, there are belligerents for whom natural justice provides no guidance other than, ‘your cause is unjust: stop fighting.’ Grotius resigns himself to the realism that, aside from exceptional cases, most states will not admit to the injustice of their cause and simply stop fighting. The longer such states fight, the more injustices they pile up by resisting the just party. Before long there would be no limit to the punitive war that could be prosecuted against the unjust state (see III.IV.iv). Grotius suggests that nations, recognizing the perils of this situation, established a custom of holding both parties in a war to have equal standing on the battlefield. That is, the law of nations permits to both sides (regardless of the justice of their cause) all the actions that the natural law would permit to the just.

The customs of warfare under the law of nations turn out to be extremely permissive. Tracking the prevailing practice of states, the customs permit everything from the slaughter of innocents to the taking of slaves and the looting of civilian property. License to conduct warfare in this way is the special privilege of sovereigns who have ‘solemnized’ their war under the law of nations. Indifferent to the substantive justice of a state’s cause, the law of nations insists instead on certain formalities—a public declaration by the sovereign authority—to give the belligerent its legal status in a solemn war (I.III.iv and III.III). While Grotius defends this status as a way of restoring normal relations between sovereigns at the end of war, he insists that even kings remain accountable to natural justice. The law of nations is derived from human will, and the license it gives in solemn wars cannot contradict the requirements of natural law. The license amounts to an agreement among nations not to punish each other for certain acts (III.IV.ii-iii). So, after many lengthy chapters detailing the range of actions permitted by the law of nations, Grotius takes an abrupt turn, telling the reader that he must now retrace his steps and “deprive those who wage war of nearly all the privileges which I seemed to grant, yet did not grant to them” (III.X.i). Those waging a solemn war may have the privilege of impunity under human law, but a ‘sense of shame’ ought to instill a respect not only for the ‘external’ judgments of the courts but for the ‘internal’ judgments of conscience (III.X and III.XI.i-ii). Those waging an unjust war will be accountable to God, and they have an (unenforceable) obligation to make restitution to those they have wronged. Even those waging war for a just cause should observe the limits of natural justice by sparing the innocent and pursuing only those war aims that are necessary to securing one’s rights. Conducting war merely within the bounds of the law of nations may obtain impunity, but it brings no badge of honor.

What makes kings and peoples worthy of honor is their observance of temperamenta: moderation and restraint in pursuing their just claims. Such restraint comes out of a respect for justice—by restricting the means of war to only what is necessary to achieving the ends—and also out of a sense of humanity. This humane concern for others seeks to limit the impact of war on the innocent and even those fighting on the opposing side (see, for example, III.XI.viii, XII.viii, and XIII.iv). It requires in many cases the remission of punishment, to forgiveness of burdensome war debts, and a preference for restoring local sovereignty rather than imposing imperial rule. At all events, one must uphold good faith in agreements made with the other side in order to build the basis for normal relations after the war (III.XXI-XXV). Humanity holds in view not only the aim of restoring rights but of restoring peace (see III.XXV.ii-iii). Justice might condone war against injuries that threaten the basis for living together in society, but a sense of humanity is fostered by the recognition that we must live together again.

5. Scholarly Interest in Grotius

In the century following his death, Grotius’ works came to be viewed as pivotal in the development of early modern moral and political philosophy. Jean Barbeyrac, in his 1749 essay on the emerging Science of Morality, described Grotius as “breaking the ice” of medieval dogma to make way for a rational approach to ethics. The natural law philosophy of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries—from Pufendorf to Locke, Vattel and Thomasius—took the framework of De Jure Belli ac pacis as a point of departure. This canonical status made Grotius required reading for Enlightenment intellectuals, such that Rousseau would come to describe him in Emile, however critically, as “the master of all the savants” and Adam Smith would credit him in his lectures on jurisprudence as giving the world the most systematic treatment of the subject to date. The 21st century has seen a renewed debate among scholars over the extent of Grotius ‘originality’ in moral thought and in what it consists: the purported secularism of his approach, its rationalism, its refutation of skepticism, its account of obligation, or a variety of other candidates. Beyond these disputes, recent historians of moral and political philosophy have taken special interest in Grotius’ conception of natural rights, his theory of punishment, and his accounts of property and state sovereignty.

Grotius’ legacy, however, is most strongly connected to his contributions to international legal theory and the laws of war. Interest in Grotius saw a revival in the late nineteenth century amid efforts to articulate and institutionalize norms of international law. The peace societies of the time, closely bound up with the international women’s suffrage movement, traced back to the Grotius the evolving conscience of the ‘civilized’ world towards justice and mercy in international conflicts. Andrew Dickson White, the U.S. delegate to the 1899 Hague Peace Conference, regarded Grotius—whom he classed among the world’s Seven Great Statesmen in the Warfare of Humanity with Unreason—as providing the “real foundation of the modern science of international law.” While the claim to being ‘father’ of this law was as disputed as it was common, and despite many critical views of this work—in his 1925 history of political philosophy, Charles Vaughan had called De Jure Belli a “nest of sophistries and contradictions”—Grotius came to have a canonical status in international legal thought. By the end of the Second World War, the legal scholar Hersch Lauterpacht was able to discern a ‘Grotian tradition in international law’ rooted in commitments to the rule of law, to norms beyond positive law, and to the human capacity for moral progress in the law. Grotius continues to be most widely known within the study of just war theory and international law, most notably for the contribution of Mare Liberum to the modern law of the sea.

The preeminence of Grotius in the field of international law exerted its influence as well on the development of international relations theory. Theorists of international relations have commonly viewed Grotius as providing a distinctive conception of international society that provides a middle way between Hobbesian anarchy and Kantian cosmopolitanism. In this schema of ‘realist,’ ‘rationalist,’ and ‘revolutionist’ theories, proposed by Martin Wight and pursued in the work of Hedley Bull and others of the ‘English School’ of international relations theory, the Grotian tradition provides a rationalist account of international society. While rejecting the idea that there are common interests among states sufficient to underpin a supranational authority, the Grotian system identifies a ‘solidarity’ of interests around basic principles of order (such as mutual independence, adherence to promises, the limitation of war) that enables sovereign states to constitute their relations as a (limited) community rather than as a contest governed by the dynamics of power alone.  The association of Grotius with this strain of thought has given his work enduring interest in contemporary international theory.

While reaching the greatest prominence in international thought, the early 21st century scholarship on Grotius has a markedly interdisciplinary character. His works have received considerable attention from political theorists and historians of political thought, as well as by those studying his contributions to moral philosophy, theology and literature. Indeed, the eclecticism of Grotius’ thought pushes beyond modern disciplinary boundaries and springs up continuing dialogues across fields and borders.

6. References and Further Reading

Included in the Primary Sources are selected works of Grotius with a preference for most recently in-print English editions. (Note: references to De Jure Belli in the article provide the book, chapter and section numbers, e.g., II.XXIV.i.). The selected secondary sources include references from the article as well as suggested directions for further reading. The interested scholar will also want to consult the regularly published journal of Grotius studies, Grotiana.

a. Primary Sources

  • Grotius, H. (2006). De Jure Praedae Commentarius / Commentary on the law of prize and booty. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1994). "Commentarius in Theses XI": an Early Treatise on Sovereignty, the Just war, and the Legitimacy of the Dutch Revolt, P. Lang.
  • Grotius, H. (2004). The Free Sea. Indianapolis, IN, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1988). Meletius. Leiden, Netherlands, Brill.
  • Grotius, H. (1990). Defensio Fidei Catholicae de Satisfactione Christi, adversus Faustum Socinum Senensem. Assen/Maastricht, the Netherlands, Van Gorcum.
  • Grotius, H. (2001). De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa Sacra. Studies in the history of Christian thought, v. 102. H.-J. v. Dam. Leiden, Brill.
  • Grotius, H. (1926). The Jurisprudence of Holland. R. W. Lee. Oxford, Clarendon Press.
  • Grotius, H. (2005). The rights of war and peace. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1962). De Jure Belli ac pacis libri tres / The Law of War and Peace. Indianapolis, Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Grotius, H. (2012). The Truth of the Christian Religion. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Borschberg, P. (1994). “Critical Introduction.” "Commentarius in Theses XI": an Early Treatise on Sovereignty, the Just War, and the Legitimacy of the Dutch Revolt. H. Grotius, P. Lang.
  • Brett, A. (2002). "Natural Right and Civil Community: The Civil Philosophy of Hugo Grotius." The Historical Journal 45(01): 31-51.
  • Bull, H., B. Kingsbury, et al. (1990). Hugo Grotius and International Relations. New York, Clarendon Press.
  • Dumbauld, E. (1969). The Life and Legal Writings of Hugo Grotius. Norman, University of Oklahoma Press.
  • Forde, S. (1998). "Hugo Grotius on Ethics and War." American Political Science Review 92(3): 639-648.
  • Haakonssen, K. (1985). "Hugo Grotius and the History of Political Thought." Political Theory 13(2): 239-265.
  • Heering, J. (2004). “Hugo Grotius' De Veritate Religionis Christianae.” Hugo Grotius as Apologist for the Christian Religion: a Study of his Work De veritate Religionis Christianae, 1640. J. Heering. Leiden, Brill: 41-52.
  • Keene, E. (2002). Beyond the Anarchical Society: Grotius, Colonialism and Order in World Politics, Cambridge University Press.
  • Kinsella, H. M. (2006). "Gendering Grotius: Sex and Sex Difference in the Laws of War." Political Theory 34(2): 161.
  • Meijer, J. (1955). "Hugo Grotius' "Remonstrantie"." Jewish Social Studies 17(2): 91-104.
  • Nellen, H. a. R. E., Ed. (1994). Hugo Grotius Theologian: Essays in Honor of G.H.M. Posthumus Meyjes. New York, Brill.
  • Onuma, Y., Ed. (1993). A Normative Approach to War: Peace, War, and Justice in Hugo Grotius. Oxford, Clarendon Press.
  • Schneewind, J. B. (1998). The Invention of Autonomy: A History of Modern Moral Philosophy. New York, Cambridge University Press, ch. 4.
  • Straumann, B. (2006). "The Right to Punish as a Just Cause of War in Hugo Grotius' Natural Law." Studies in the History of Ethics.
  • Suárez, F. (1944). De Legibus. Selections from Three Works. New York: Clarendon Press.
  • Thomson, E. (2009). "The Dutch Miracle, Modified. Hugo Grotius's Mare Liberum, Commercial Governance and Imperial War in the Early-Seventeenth Century." Grotiana 30(1): 107-130.
  • Tuck, R. (1993). Philosophy and Government, 1572-1651. New York, Cambridge University Press, ch. 5.
  • Tuck, R. (1999). The Rights of War and Peace : Political Thought and the International Order from Grotius to Kant. New York, Oxford University Press, ch. 3.
  • van Gelderen, M. (1993). “Vitoria, Grotius and Human Rights: The Early Experience of Colonialism in Spanish and Dutch Political Thought.” Human Rights and Cultural Diversity. W. Schmale. Goldbach, Germany, Keip Publishing: 215-238.
  • van Gelderen, M. (2006). 'So Meerly Humane': Theories of Resistance in Early-Modern Europe. Rethinking the Foundations of Modern Political Thought. A. S. Brett, J. Tully and H. Hamilton-Bleakley. New York, Cambridge University Press: 149-170.
  • van Ittersum, M. J. (2006). Profit and Principle : Hugo Grotius, Natural Rights Theories and the Rise of Dutch Power in the East Indies, 1595-1615. Leiden, Brill.
  • van Ittersum, M. J. (2010). "The Long Goodbye: Hugo Grotius' Lustification of Dutch Expansion Overseas, 1615-1645." History of European Ideas 36: 386-411.
  • Vitoria, F. d. (1991). On the American Indians. Political writings. A. L. J. Pagden. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Vitoria, F. d. (1991). On the Law of War. Political writings. A. L. J. Pagden. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Vreeland, H. (1917). Hugo Grotius, the Father of the Modern Science of International Law. New York, Oxford University Press.
  • Wilson, E. M. (2008). The Savage Republic: De Indis of Hugo Grotius, Republicanism, and Dutch Hegemony within the Early Modern World-System (c. 1600-1619), Martinus Nijhoff Publishers.

 

Author Information

Andrew Blom
Email: andrew.blom@cmich.edu
Central Michigan University
U. S. A.

Gottfried Leibniz: Philosophy of Mind

LeibnizGottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) was a true polymath: he made substantial contributions to a host of different fields such as mathematics, law, physics, theology, and most subfields of philosophy.  Within the philosophy of mind, his chief innovations include his rejection of the Cartesian doctrines that all mental states are conscious and that non-human animals lack souls as well as sensation.  Leibniz’s belief that non-rational animals have souls and feelings prompted him to reflect much more thoroughly than many of his predecessors on the mental capacities that distinguish human beings from lower animals.  Relatedly, the acknowledgment of unconscious mental representations and motivations enabled Leibniz to provide a far more sophisticated account of human psychology.  It also led Leibniz to hold that perception—rather than consciousness, as Cartesians assume—is the distinguishing mark of mentality.

The capacities that make human minds superior to animal souls, according to Leibniz, include not only their capacity for more elevated types of perceptions or mental representations, but also their capacity for more elevated types of appetitions or mental tendencies.  Self-consciousness and abstract thought are examples of perceptions that are exclusive to rational souls, while reasoning and the tendency to do what one judges to be best overall are examples of appetitions of which only rational souls are capable.  The mental capacity for acting freely is another feature that sets human beings apart from animals and it in fact presupposes the capacity for elevated kinds of perceptions as well as appetitions.

Another crucial contribution to the philosophy of mind is Leibniz’s frequently cited mill argument.  This argument is supposed to show, through a thought experiment that involves walking into a mill, that material things such as machines or brains cannot possibly have mental states.  Only immaterial things, that is, soul-like entities, are able to think or perceive.  If this argument succeeds, it shows not only that our minds must be immaterial or that we must have souls, but also that we will never be able to construct a computer that can truly think or perceive.

Finally, Leibniz’s doctrine of pre-established harmony also marks an important innovation in the history of the philosophy of mind.  Like occasionalists, Leibniz denies any genuine interaction between body and soul.  He agrees with them that the fact that my foot moves when I decide to move it, as well as the fact that I feel pain when my body gets injured, cannot be explained by a genuine causal influence of my soul on my body, or of my body on my soul.  Yet, unlike occasionalists, Leibniz also rejects the idea that God continually intervenes in order to produce the correspondence between my soul and my body.  That, Leibniz thinks, would be unworthy of God.  Instead, God has created my soul and my body in such a way that they naturally correspond to each other, without any interaction or divine intervention.  My foot moves when I decide to move it because this motion has been programmed into it from the very beginning.  Likewise, I feel pain when my body is injured because this pain was programmed into my soul.  The harmony or correspondence between mental states and states of the body is therefore pre-established.

Table of Contents

  1. Leibnizian Minds and Mental States
    1. Perceptions
      1. Consciousness, Apperception, and Reflection
      2. Abstract Thought, Concepts, and Universal Truths
    2. Appetitions
  2. Freedom
  3. The Mill Argument
  4. The Relation between Mind and Body
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources in English Translation
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Leibnizian Minds and Mental States

Leibniz is a panpsychist: he believes that everything, including plants and inanimate objects, has a mind or something analogous to a mind.  More specifically, he holds that in all things there are simple, immaterial, mind-like substances that perceive the world around them.  Leibniz calls these mind-like substances ‘monads.’  While all monads have perceptions, however, only some of them are aware of what they perceive, that is, only some of them possess sensation or consciousness.  Even fewer monads are capable of self-consciousness and rational perceptions.  Leibniz typically refers to monads that are capable of sensation or consciousness as ‘souls,’ and to those that are also capable of self-consciousness and rational perceptions as ‘minds.’  The monads in plants, for instance, lack all sensation and consciousness and are hence neither souls nor minds; Leibniz sometimes calls this least perfect type of monad a ‘bare monad’ and compares the mental states of such monads to our states when we are in a stupor or a dreamless sleep.  Animals, on the other hand, can sense and be conscious, and thus possess souls (see Animal Minds).  God and the souls of human beings and angels, finally, are examples of minds because they are self-conscious and rational.  As a result, even though there are mind-like things everywhere for Leibniz, minds in the stricter sense are not ubiquitous.

All monads, even those that lack consciousness altogether, have two basic types of mental states: perceptions, that is, representations of the world around them, and appetitions, or tendencies to transition from one representation to another.  Hence, even though monads are similar to the minds or souls described by Descartes in some ways—after all, they are immaterial substances—consciousness is not an essential property of monads, while it is an essential property of Cartesian souls.  For Leibniz, then, the distinguishing mark of mentality is perception, rather than consciousness (see Simmons 2001).  In fact, even Leibnizian minds in the stricter sense, that is, monads capable of self-consciousness and reasoning, are quite different from the minds in Descartes’s system.  While Cartesian minds are conscious of all their mental states, Leibnizian minds are conscious only of a small portion of their states.  To us it may seem obvious that there is a host of unconscious states in our minds, but in the seventeenth century this was a radical and novel notion.  This profound departure from Cartesian psychology allows Leibniz to paint a much more nuanced picture of the human mind.

One crucial aspect of Leibniz’s panpsychism is that in addition to the rational monad that is the soul of a human being, there are non-rational, bare monads everywhere in the human being’s body.  Leibniz sometimes refers to the soul of a human being or animal as the central or dominant monad of the organism.  The bare monads that are in an animal’s body, accordingly, are subordinate to its dominant monad or soul.  Even plants, for Leibniz, have central or dominant monads, but because they lack sensation, these dominant monads cannot strictly speaking be called souls.  They are merely bare monads, like the monads that are subordinate to them.

The claim that there are mind-like things everywhere in nature—in our bodies, in plants, and even in inanimate objects—strikes many readers of Leibniz as ludicrous.  Yet, Leibniz thinks he has conclusive metaphysical arguments for this claim.  Very roughly, he holds that a complex, divisible thing such as a body can only be real if it is made up of parts that are real.  If the parts in turn have parts, those have to be real as well.  The problem is, Leibniz claims, that matter is infinitely divisible: we can never reach parts that do not themselves have parts.  Even if there were material atoms that we cannot actually divide, they must still be spatially extended, like all matter, and therefore have spatial parts.  If something is spatially extended, after all, we can at least in thought distinguish its left half from its right half, no matter how small it is.  As a result, Leibniz thinks, purely material things are not real.  The reality of complex wholes depends on the reality of their parts, but with purely material things, we never get to parts that are real since we never reach an end in this quest for reality.  Leibniz concludes that there must be something in nature that is not material and not divisible, and from which all things derive their reality.  These immaterial, indivisible things just are monads.  Because of the role they play, Leibniz sometimes describes them as “atoms of substance, that is, real unities absolutely destitute of parts, […] the first absolute principles of the composition of things, and, as it were, the final elements in the analysis of substantial things”  (p. 142.  For a more thorough description of monads, see Leibniz: Metaphysics, as well as the Monadology and the New System of Nature, both included in Ariew and Garber.)

a. Perceptions

As already seen, all monads have perceptions, that is, they represent the world around them.  Yet, not all perceptions—not even all the perceptions of minds—are conscious.  In fact, Leibniz holds that at any given time a mind has infinitely many perceptions, but is conscious only of a very small number of them.  Even souls and bare monads have an infinity of perceptions.  This is because Leibniz believes, for reasons that need not concern us here (but see Leibniz: Metaphysics), that each monad constantly perceives the entire universe.  For instance, even though I am not aware of it at all, my mind is currently representing every single grain of sand on Mars.  Even the monads in my little toe, as well as the monads in the apple I am about to eat, represent those grains of sand.

Leibniz often describes perceptions of things of which the subject is unaware and which are far removed from the subject’s body as ‘confused.’  He is fond of using the sound of the ocean as a metaphor for this kind of confusion: when I go to the beach, I do not hear the sound of each individual wave distinctly; instead, I hear a roaring sound from which I am unable to discern the sounds of the individual waves (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 13, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  None of these individual sounds stands out.  Leibniz claims that confused perceptions in monads are analogous to this confusion of sounds, except of course for the fact that monads do not have to be aware even of the confused whole.  To the extent that a perception does stand out from the rest, however, Leibniz calls it ‘distinct.’  This distinctness comes in degrees, and Leibniz claims that the central monads of organisms always perceive their own bodies more distinctly than they perceive other bodies.

Bare monads are not capable of very distinct perceptions; their perceptual states are always muddled and confused to a high degree.  Animal souls, on the other hand, can have much more distinct perceptions than bare monads.  This is in part because they possess sense organs, such as eyes, which allow them to bundle and condense information about their surroundings (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 4).  The resulting perceptions are so distinct that the animals can remember them later, and Leibniz calls this kind of perception ‘sensation.’  The ability to remember prior perceptions is extremely useful, as a matter of fact, because it enables animals to learn from experience.  For instance, a dog that remembers being beaten with a stick can learn to avoid sticks in the future (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  Sensations are also tied to pleasure and pain: when an animal distinctly perceives some imperfection in its body, such as a bruise, this perception just is a feeling of pain.  Similarly, when an animal perceives some perfection of its body, such as nourishment, this perception is pleasure.  Unlike Descartes, then, Leibniz believed that animals are capable of feeling pleasure and pain.

Consequently, souls differ from bare monads in part through the distinctness of their perceptions: unlike bare monads, souls can have perceptions that are distinct enough to give rise to memory and sensation, and they can feel pleasure and pain.  Rational souls, or minds, share these capacities.  Yet they are additionally capable of perceptions of an even higher level.  Unlike the souls of lower animals, they can reflect on their own mental states, think abstractly, and acquire knowledge of necessary truths.  For instance, they are capable of understanding mathematical concepts and proofs.  Moreover, they can think of themselves as substances and subjects: they have the ability to use and understand the word ‘I’ (see Monadology, section 30).  These kinds of perceptions, for Leibniz, are distinctively rational perceptions, and they are exclusive to minds or rational souls.

It is clear, then, that there are different types of perceptions: some are unconscious, some are conscious, and some constitute reflection or abstract thought.  What exactly distinguishes these types of perceptions, however, is a complicated question that warrants a more detailed investigation.

i. Consciousness, Apperception, and Reflection

Why are some perceptions conscious, while others are not?  In one text, Leibniz explains the difference as follows: “it is good to distinguish between perception, which is the internal state of the monad representing external things, and apperception, which is consciousness, or the reflective knowledge of this internal state, something not given to all souls, nor at all times to a given soul” (Principles of Nature and Grace, section 4).  This passage is interesting for several reasons: Leibniz not only equates consciousness with what he calls ‘apperception,’ and states that only some monads possess it.  He also seems to claim that conscious perceptions differ from other perceptions in virtue of having different types of things as their objects: while unconscious perceptions represent external things, apperception or consciousness has perceptions, that is, internal things, as its object.  Consciousness is therefore closely connected to reflection, as the term ‘reflective knowledge’ also makes clear.

The passage furthermore suggests that Leibniz understands consciousness in terms of higher-order mental states because it says that in order to be conscious of a perception, I must possess “reflective knowledge” of that perception.  One way of interpreting this statement is to understand these higher-order mental states as higher-order perceptions: in order to be conscious of a first-order perception, I must additionally possess a second-order perception of that first-order perception.  For example, in order to be conscious of the glass of water in front of me, I must not only perceive the glass of water, but I must also perceive my perception of the glass of water.  After all, in the passage under discussion, Leibniz defines ‘consciousness’ or ‘apperception’ as the reflective knowledge of a perception.  Such higher-order theories of consciousness are still endorsed by some philosophers of mind today (see Consciousness).  For an alternative interpretation of Leibniz’s theory of consciousness, however, see Jorgensen 2009, 2011a, and 2011b).

There is excellent textual evidence that according to Leibniz, consciousness or apperception is not limited to minds, but is instead shared by animal souls.  One passage in which Leibniz explicitly ascribes apperception to animals is from the New Essays: “beasts have no understanding … although they have the faculty for apperceiving the more conspicuous and outstanding impressions—as when a wild boar apperceives someone who is shouting at it” (p. 173).  Moreover, Leibniz sometimes claims that sensation involves apperception (e.g. New Essays p. 161; p. 188), and since animals are clearly capable of sensation, they must thus possess some form of apperception.  Hence, it seems that Leibniz ascribes apperception to animals, which in turn he elsewhere identifies with consciousness.

Yet, the textual evidence for animal consciousness is unfortunately anything but neat because in the New Essays—that is, in the very same text—Leibniz also suggests that there is an important difference between animals and human beings somewhere in this neighborhood.  In several passages, he says that any creature with consciousness has a moral or personal identity, which in turn is something he grants only to minds.  He states, for instance, that “consciousness or the sense of I proves moral or personal identity” (New Essays, p. 236).  Hence, it seems clear that for Leibniz there is something in the vicinity of consciousness that animals lack and that minds possess, and which is crucial for morality.

A promising solution to this interpretive puzzle is the following: what animals lack is not consciousness generally, but only a particular type of consciousness.  More specifically, while they are capable of consciously perceiving external things, they lack awareness, or at least a particular type of awareness, of the self.  In the Monadology, for instance, Leibniz argues that knowledge of necessary truths distinguishes us from animals and that through this knowledge “we rise to reflexive acts, which enable us to think of that which is called ‘I’ and enable us to consider that this or that is in us” (sections 29-30).  Similarly, he writes in the Principles of Nature and Grace that “minds … are capable of performing reflective acts, and capable of considering what is called ‘I’, substance, soul, mind—in brief, immaterial things and immaterial truths” (section 5).  Self-knowledge, or self-consciousness, then, appears to be exclusive to rational souls.  Leibniz moreover connects this consciousness of the self to personhood and moral responsibility in several texts, such as for instance in the Theodicy: “In saying that the soul of man is immortal one implies the subsistence of what makes the identity of the person, something which retains its moral qualities, conserving the consciousness, or the reflective inward feeling, of what it is: thus it is rendered susceptible to chastisement or reward” (section 89).

Based on these passages, it seems that one crucial cognitive difference between human beings and animals is that even though animals possess the kind of apperception that is involved in sensation and in an acute awareness of external objects, they lack a certain type of apperception or consciousness, namely reflective self-knowledge or self-consciousness.  Especially because of the moral implications of this kind of consciousness that Leibniz posits, this difference is clearly an extremely important one.  According to these texts, then, it is not consciousness or apperception tout court that distinguishes minds from animal souls, but rather a particular kind of apperception.  What animals are incapable of, according to Leibniz, is self-knowledge or self-awareness, that is, an awareness not only of their perceptions, but also of the self that is having those perceptions.

Because Leibniz associates consciousness so closely with reflection, one might wonder whether the fact that animals are capable of conscious perceptions implies that they are also capable of reflection.  This is another difficult interpretive question because there appears to be evidence both for a positive and for a negative answer.  Reflection, according to Leibniz, is “nothing but attention to what is within us” (New Essays, p. 51).  Moreover, as already seen, he argues that reflective acts enable us “to think of that which is called ‘I’ and … to consider that this or that is in us” (Monadology, section 30).  Leibniz does not appear to ascribe reflection to animals explicitly, and in fact, there are several texts in which he says in no uncertain terms that they lack reflection altogether.  He states for instance that “the soul of a beast has no more reflection than an atom” (Loemker, p. 588).  Likewise, he defines ‘intellection’ as “a distinct perception combined with a faculty of reflection, which the beasts do not have” (New Essays, p. 173) and explains that “just as there are two sorts of perception, one simple, the other accompanied by reflections that give rise to knowledge and reasoning, so there are two kinds of souls, namely ordinary souls, whose perception is without reflection, and rational souls, which think about what they do” (Strickland, p. 84).

On the other hand, as seen, Leibniz does ascribe apperception or consciousness to animals, and consciousness in turn appears to involve higher-order mental states.  This suggests that Leibnizian animals must perceive or know their own perceptions when they are conscious of something, and that in turn seems to imply that they can reflect after all.  A closely related reason for ascribing reflection to animals is that Leibniz sometimes explicitly associates reflection with apperception or consciousness.  In a passage already quoted above, for instance, Leibniz defines ‘consciousness’ as the reflective knowledge of a first-order perception.  Hence, if animals possess consciousness it seems that they must also have some type of reflection.

We are consequently faced with an interpretive puzzle: even though there is strong indirect evidence that Leibniz attributes reflection to animals, there is also direct evidence against it.  There are at least two ways of solving this puzzle.  In order to make sense of passages in which Leibniz restricts reflection to rational souls, one can either deny that perceiving one’s internal states is sufficient for reflection, or one can distinguish between different types of reflection, in such a way that the most demanding type of reflection is limited to minds.  One good way to deny that perception of one’s internal states is sufficient for reflection is to point out that Leibniz defines reflection as “attention to what is within us” (New Essays, p. 51), rather than as ‘perception of what is within us.’  Attention to internal states, arguably, is more demanding than mere perception of these states, and animals may well be incapable of the former.  Attention might be a particularly distinct perception, for instance.  Alternatively, one can argue that reflection requires a self-concept, or self-knowledge, which also goes beyond the mere perception of internal states and may be inaccessible to animals.  Perceiving my internal states, on that interpretation, amounts to reflection only if I also possess knowledge of the self that is having those states.  Instead of denying that perceiving one’s own states is sufficient for reflection, one can also distinguish different types of reflection and claim that while the mere perception of one’s internal states is a type of reflection, there is a more demanding type of reflection that requires attention, a self-concept, or something similar.  Yet, the difference between those two responses appears to be merely terminological.  Based on the textual evidence discussed above, it is clear that either reflection generally, or at least a particular type of reflection, must be exclusive to minds.

ii. Abstract Thought, Concepts, and Universal Truths

So far, we have seen that one cognitive capacity that elevates minds above animal souls is self-consciousness, which is a particular type of reflection.  Before turning to appetitions, we should briefly investigate three additional, mutually related, cognitive abilities that only minds possess, namely the abilities to abstract, to form or possess concepts, and to know general truths.  In what may well be Leibniz’s most intriguing discussion of abstraction, he says that some non-human animals “apparently recognize whiteness, and observe it in chalk as in snow; but it does not amount to abstraction, which requires attention to the general apart from the particular, and consequently involves knowledge of universal truths which beasts do not possess” (New Essays, p. 142).  In this passage, we learn not only that beasts are incapable of abstraction, but also that abstraction involves “attention to the general apart from the particular” as well as “knowledge of universal truths.”  Hence, abstraction for Leibniz seems to consist in separating out one part of a complex idea and focusing on it exclusively.  Instead of thinking of different white things, one must think of whiteness in general, abstracting away from the particular instances of whiteness.  In order to think about whiteness in the abstract, then, it is not enough to perceive different white things as similar to one another.

Yet, it might still seem mysterious how precisely animals should be able to observe whiteness in different objects if they are unable to abstract.  One fact that makes this less mysterious, however, is that, on Leibniz’s view, while animals are unable to pay attention to whiteness in general, the idea of whiteness may nevertheless play a role in their recognition of whiteness.  As Leibniz explains in the New Essays, even though human minds are aware of complex ideas and particular truths first as well as rather easily, and have to expend a lot of effort to subsequently achieve awareness of simple ideas and general principles, the order of nature is the other way around:

The truths that we start by being aware of are indeed particular ones, just as we start with the coarsest and most composite ideas.  But that doesn’t alter the fact that in the order of nature the simplest comes first, and that the reasons for particular truths rest wholly on the more general ones of which they are mere instances. … The mind relies on these principles constantly; but it does not find it so easy to sort them out and to command a distinct view of each of them separately, for that requires great attention to what it is doing. (p. 83f.)

Here, Leibniz says that minds can rely on general principles, or abstract ideas, without being aware of them, and without having distinct perceptions of them separately.  This might help us to explain how animals can observe whiteness in different white objects without being able to abstract: the simple idea of whiteness might play a role in their cognition, even though they are not aware of it, and are unable to pay attention to this idea.

The passage just quoted is interesting for another reason: It shows that abstracting and achieving knowledge of general truths have a lot in common and presuppose the capacity to reflect.  It takes a special effort of mind to become aware of abstract ideas and general truths, that is, to separate these out from complex ideas and particular truths.  It is this special effort, it seems, of which animals are incapable; while they can at times achieve relatively distinct perceptions of complex or particular things, they lack the ability to pay attention, or at least sufficient attention, to their internal states.  At least part of the reason for their inability to abstract and to know general truths, then, appears to be their inability, or at least very limited ability, to reflect.

Abstraction also seems closely related to the possession or formation of concepts: arguably, what a mind gains when abstracting the idea of whiteness from the complex ideas of particular white things is what we would call a concept of whiteness.  Hence, since animals cannot abstract, they do not possess such concepts.  They may nevertheless, as suggested above, have confused ideas such as a confused idea of whiteness that allows them to recognize whiteness in different white things, without enabling them to pay attention to whiteness in the abstract.

An interesting question that arises in this context is the question whether having an idea of the future or thinking about a future state requires abstraction.  One reason to think so is that, plausibly, in order to think about the future, for instance about future pleasures or pains, one needs to abstract from the present pleasures or pains that one can directly experience, or from past pleasures and pains that one remembers.  After all, just as one can only attain the concept of whiteness by abstracting from other properties of the particular white things one has experienced, so, arguably, one can only acquire the idea of future pleasures through abstraction from particular present pleasures.  It may be for this reason that Leibniz sometimes notes that animals have “neither foresight nor anxiety for the future” (Huggard, p. 414).  Apparently, he does not consider animals capable of having an idea of the future or of future states.

Leibniz thinks that in addition to sensible concepts such as whiteness, we also have concepts that are not derived from the senses, that is, we possess intellectual concepts.  The latter, it seems, set us apart even farther from animals because we attain them through reflective self-awareness, of which animals, as seen above, are not capable.  Leibniz says, for instance, that “being is innate in us—the knowledge of being is comprised in the knowledge that we have of ourselves.  Something like this holds of other general notions” (New Essays, p. 102).  Similarly, he states a few pages later that “reflection enables us to find the idea of substance within ourselves, who are substances” (New Essays, p. 105).  Many similar statements can be found elsewhere.  The intellectual concepts that we can discover in our souls, according to Leibniz, include not only being and substance, but also unity, similarity, sameness, pleasure, cause, perception, action, duration, doubting, willing, and reasoning, to name only a few.  In order to derive these concepts from our reflective self-awareness, we must apparently engage in abstraction: I am distinctly aware of myself as an agent, a substance, and a perceiver, for instance, and from this awareness I can abstract the ideas of action, substance, and perception in general.  This means that animals are inferior to us among other things in the following two ways: they cannot have distinct self-awareness, and they cannot abstract.  They would need both of these capacities in order to form intellectual concepts, and they would need the latter—that is, abstraction—in order to form sensible concepts.

Intellectual concepts are not the only things that minds can find in themselves: in addition, they are also able to discover eternal or general truths there, such as the axioms or principles of logic, metaphysics, ethics, and natural theology.  Like the intellectual concepts just mentioned, these general truths or principles cannot be derived from the senses and can thus be classified as innate ideas.  Leibniz says, for instance,

Above all, we find [in this I and in the understanding] the force of the conclusions of reasoning, which are part of what is called the natural light. … It is also by this natural light that the axioms of mathematics are recognized. … [I]t is generally true that we know [necessary truths] only by this natural light, and not at all by the experiences of the senses. (Ariew and Garber, p. 189)

Axioms and general principles, according to this passage, must come from the mind itself and cannot be acquired through sense experience.  Yet, also as in the case of intellectual concepts, it is not easy for us to discover such general truths or principles in ourselves; instead, it takes effort or special attention.  It again appears to require the kind of attention to what is within us of which animals are not capable.  Because they lack this type of reflection, animals are “governed purely by examples from the senses” and “consequently can never arrive at necessary and general truths” (Strickland p. 84).

b. Appetitions

Monads possess not only perceptions, or representations of the world they inhabit, but also appetitions.  These appetitions are the tendencies or inclinations of these monads to act, that is, to transition from one mental state to another.  The most familiar examples of appetitions are conscious desires, such as my desire to have a drink of water.  Having this desire means that I have some tendency to drink from the glass of water in front of me.  If the desire is strong enough, and if there are no contrary tendencies or desires in my mind that are stronger—for instance, the desire to win the bet that I can refrain from drinking water for one hour—I will attempt to drink the water.  This desire for water is one example of a Leibnizian appetition.  Yet, just as in the case of perceptions, only a very small portion of appetitions is conscious.  We are unaware of most of the tendencies that lead to changes in our perceptions.  For instance, I am aware neither of perceiving my hair growing, nor of my tendencies to have those perceptions.  Moreover, as in the case of perceptions, there are an infinite number of appetitions in any monad at any given time.  This is because, as seen, each monad represents the entire universe.  As a result, each monad constantly transitions from one infinitely complex perceptual state to another, reflecting all changes that take place in the universe.  The tendency that leads to a monad’s transition from one of these infinitely complex perceptual states to another is therefore also infinitely complex, or composed of infinitely many smaller appetitions.

The three types of monads—bare monads, souls, and minds—differ not only with respect to their perceptual or cognitive capacities, but also with respect to their appetitive capacities.  In fact, there are good reasons to think that three different types of appetitions correspond to the three types of perceptions mentioned above, that is, to perception, sensation, and rational perception.  After all, Leibniz distinguishes between appetitions of which we can be aware and those of which we cannot be aware, which he sometimes also calls ‘insensible appetitions’ or ‘insensible inclinations.’  He appears to further divide the type of which we can be aware into rational and non-rational appetitions.  This threefold division is made explicit in a passage from the New Essays:

There are insensible inclinations of which we are not aware.  There are sensible ones: we are acquainted with their existence and their objects, but have no sense of how they are constituted. … Finally there are distinct inclinations which reason gives us: we have a sense both of their strength and of their constitution. (p. 194)

According to this passage, then, Leibniz acknowledges the following three types of appetitions: (a) insensible or unconscious appetitions, (b) sensible or conscious appetitions, and (c) distinct or rational appetitions.

Even though Leibniz does not say so explicitly, he furthermore believes that bare monads have only unconscious appetitions, that animal souls additionally have conscious appetitions, and that only minds have distinct or rational appetitions.  Unconscious appetitions are tendencies such as the one that leads to my perception of my hair growing, or the one that prompts me unexpectedly to perceive the sound of my alarm in the morning.  All appetitions in bare monads are of this type; they are not aware of any of their tendencies.  An example of a sensible appetition, on the other hand, is an appetition for pleasure.  My desire for a piece of chocolate, for instance, is such an appetition: I am aware that I have this desire and I know what the object of the desire is, but I do not fully understand why I have it.  Animals are capable of this kind of appetition; in fact, many of their actions are motivated by their appetitions for pleasure.  Finally, an example of a rational appetition is the appetition for something that my intellect has judged to be the best course of action.  Leibniz appears to identify the capacity for this kind of appetition with the will, which, as we will see below, plays a crucial role in Leibniz’s theory of freedom.  What is distinctive of this kind of appetition is that whenever we possess it, we are not only aware of it and of its object, but also understand why we have it.  For instance, if I judge that I ought to call my mother and consequently desire to call her, Leibniz thinks, I am aware of the thought process that led me to make this judgment, and hence of the origins of my desire.

Another type of rational appetition is the type of appetition involved in reasoning.  As seen, Leibniz thinks that animals, because they can remember prior perceptions, are able to learn from experience, like the dog that learns to run away from sticks.  This sort of behavior, which involves a kind of inductive inference (see Deductive and Inductive Arguments), can be called a “shadow of reasoning,” Leibniz tells us (New Essays, p. 50).  Yet, animals are incapable of true—that is, presumably, deductive—reasoning, which, Leibniz tells us, “depends on necessary or eternal truths, such as those of logic, numbers, and geometry, which bring about an indubitable connection of ideas and infallible consequences” (Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  Only minds can reason in this stricter sense.

Some interpreters think that reasoning consists simply in very distinct perception.  Yet that cannot be the whole story.  First of all, reasoning must involve a special type of perception that differs from the perceptions of lower animals in kind, rather than merely in degree, namely abstract thought and the perception of eternal truths.  This kind of perception is not just more distinct; it has entirely different objects than the perceptions of non-rational souls, as we saw above.  Moreover, it seems more accurate to describe reasoning as a special kind of appetition or tendency than as a special kind of perception.  This is because reasoning is not just one perception, but rather a series of perceptions.  Leibniz for instance calls it “a chain of truths” (New Essays, p. 199) and defines it as “the linking together of truths” (Huggard, p. 73).  Thus, reasoning is not the same as perceiving a certain type of object, nor as perceiving an object in a particular fashion.  Rather, it consists mainly in special types of transitions between perceptions and therefore, according to Leibniz’s account of how monads transition from perception to perception, in appetitions for these transitions.  What a mind needs in order to be rational, therefore, are appetitions that one could call the principles of reasoning.  These appetitions or principles allow minds to transition, for instance, from the premises of an argument to its conclusion.  In order to conclude ‘Socrates is mortal’ from ‘All men are mortal’ and ‘Socrates is a man,’ for example, I not only need to perceive the premises distinctly, but I also need an appetition for transitioning from premises of a particular form to conclusions of a particular form.

Leibniz states in several texts that our reasonings are based on two fundamental principles: the Principle of Contradiction and the Principle of Sufficient Reason.  Human beings also have access to several additional innate truths and principles, for instance those of logic, mathematics, ethics, and theology.  In virtue of these principles we have a priori knowledge of necessary connections between things, while animals can only have empirical knowledge of contingent, or merely apparent, connections.  The perceptions of animals, then, are not governed by the principles on which our reasonings are based; the closest an animal can come to reasoning is, as mentioned, engaging in empirical inference or induction, which is based not on principles of reasoning, but merely on the recognition and memory of regularities in previous experience.  This confirms that reasoning is a type of appetition: using, or being able to use, principles of reasoning cannot just be a matter of perceiving the world more distinctly.  In fact, these principles are not something that we acquire or derive from perceptions.  Instead, at least the most basic ones are innate dispositions for making certain kinds of transitions.

In connection with reasoning, it is important to note that even though Leibniz sometimes uses the term ‘thought’ for perceptions generally, he makes it clear in some texts that it strictly speaking belongs exclusively to minds because it is “perception joined with reason” (Strickland p. 66; see also New Essays, p. 210).  This means that the ability to think in this sense, just like reasoning, is also something that is exclusive to minds, that is, something that distinguishes minds from animal souls.  Non-rational souls neither reason nor think, strictly speaking; they do however have perceptions.

The distinctive cognitive and appetitive capacities of the three types of monads are summarized in the following table:

Leibniz-Mind table

2. Freedom

One final capacity that sets human beings apart from non-rational animals is the capacity for acting freely.  This is mainly because Leibniz closely connects free agency with rationality: acting freely requires acting in accordance with one’s rational assessment of which course of action is best.  Hence, acting freely involves rational perceptions as well as rational appetitions.  It requires both knowledge of, or rational judgments about, the good, as well as the tendency to act in accordance with these judgments.  For Leibniz, the capacity for rational judgments is called ‘intellect,’ and the tendency to pursue what the intellect judges to be best is called ‘will.’  Non-human animals, because they do not possess intellects and wills, or the requisite type of perceptions and appetitions, lack freedom.  This also means, however, that most human actions are not free, because we only sometimes reason about the best course of action and act voluntarily, on the basis of our rational judgments.  Leibniz in fact stresses that in three quarters of their actions, human beings act just like animals, that is, without making use of their rationality (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).

In addition to rationality, Leibniz claims, free actions must be self-determined and contingent (see e.g. Theodicy, section 288).  An action is self-determined—or spontaneous, as Leibniz often calls it—when its source is in the agent, rather than in another agent or some other external entity.  While all actions of monads are spontaneous in a general sense since, as we will see in section four, Leibniz denies all interaction among created substances, he may have a more demanding notion of spontaneity in mind when he calls it a requirement for freedom.  After all, when an agent acts on the basis of her rational judgment, she is not even subject to the kind of apparent influence of her body or of other creatures that is present, for instance, when someone pinches her and she feels pain.

In order to be contingent, on the other hand, the action cannot be the result of compulsion or necessitation.  This, again, is generally true for all actions of monads because Leibniz holds that all changes in the states of a creature are contingent.  Yet, there may again be an especially demanding sense in which free actions are contingent for Leibniz.  He often says that when a rational agent does something because she believes it to be best, the goodness she perceives, or her motives for acting, merely incline her towards action without necessitating action (see e.g. Huggard, p. 419; Fifth Letter to Clarke, sections 8-9; Ariew and Garber, p. 195; New Essays, p. 175).  Hence, Leibniz may be attributing a particular kind of contingency to free actions.

Even though Leibniz holds that free actions must be contingent, that is, that they cannot be necessary, he grants that they can be determined.  In fact, Leibniz vehemently rejects the notion that a world with free agents must contain genuine indeterminacy.  Hence, Leibniz is what we today call a compatibilist about freedom and determinism (see Free Will).  He believes that all actions, whether they are free or not, are determined by the nature and the prior states of the agent.  What is special about free actions, then, is not that they are undetermined, but rather that they are determined, among other things, by rational perceptions of the good.  We always do what we are most strongly inclined to do, for Leibniz, and if we are most strongly inclined by our judgment about the best course of action, we pursue that course of action freely.  The ability to act contrary even to one’s best reasons or motives, Leibniz contends, is not required for freedom, nor would it be worth having.   As Leibniz puts it in the New Essays, “the freedom to will contrary to all the impressions which may come from the understanding … would destroy true liberty, and reason with it, and would bring us down below the beasts” (p. 180).  In fact, being determined by our rational understanding of the good, as we are in our free actions, makes us godlike, because according to Leibniz, God is similarly determined by what he judges to be best.  Nothing could be more perfect and more desirable than acting in this way.

3. The Mill Argument

In several of his writings, Leibniz argues that purely material things such as brains or machines cannot possibly think or perceive.  Hence, Leibniz contends that materialists like Thomas Hobbes are wrong to think that they can explain mentality in terms of the brain.  This argument is without question among Leibniz’s most influential contributions to the philosophy of mind.  It is relevant not only to the question whether human minds might be purely material, but also to the question whether artificial intelligence is possible.  Because Leibniz’s argument against perception in material objects often employs a thought experiment involving a mill, interpreters refer to it as ‘the mill argument.’  There is considerable disagreement among recent scholars about the correct interpretation of this argument (see References and Further Reading).  The present section sketches one plausible way of interpreting Leibniz’s mill argument.

The most famous version of Leibniz’s mill argument occurs in section 17 of the Monadology:

Moreover, we must confess that perception, and what depends on it, is inexplicable in terms of mechanical reasons, that is, through shapes and motions.  If we imagine that there is a machine whose structure makes it think, sense, and have perceptions, we could conceive it enlarged, keeping the same proportions, so that we could enter into it, as one enters into a mill.  Assuming that, when inspecting its interior, we will only find parts that push one another, and we will never find anything to explain a perception.  And so, we should seek perception in the simple substance and not in the composite or in the machine.

To understand this argument, it is important to recall that Leibniz, like many of his contemporaries, views all material things as infinitely divisible.  As already seen, he holds that there are no smallest or most fundamental material elements, and every material thing, no matter how small, has parts and is hence complex.  Even if there were physical atoms—against which Leibniz thinks he has conclusive metaphysical arguments—they would still have to be extended, like all matter, and we would hence be able to distinguish between an atom’s left half and its right half.  The only truly simple things that exist are monads, that is, unextended, immaterial, mind-like things.  Based on this understanding of material objects, Leibniz argues in the mill passage that only immaterial entities are capable of perception because it is impossible to explain perception mechanically, or in terms of material parts pushing one another.

Unfortunately Leibniz does not say explicitly why exactly he thinks there cannot be a mechanical explanation of perception.  Yet it becomes clear in other passages that for Leibniz perceiving has to take place in a simple thing.  This assumption, in turn, straightforwardly implies that matter—which as seen is complex—is incapable of perception.  This, most likely, is behind Leibniz’s mill argument.  Why does Leibniz claim that perception can only take place in simple things?  If he did not have good reasons for this claim, after all, it would not constitute a convincing starting point for his mill argument.

Leibniz’s reasoning appears to be the following.  Material things, such as mirrors or paintings, can represent complexity.  When I stand in front of a mirror, for instance, the mirror represents my body.  This is an example of the representation of one complex material thing in another complex material thing.  Yet, Leibniz argues, we do not call such a representation ‘perception’: the mirror does not “perceive” my body.  The reason this representation falls short of perception, Leibniz contends, is that it lacks the unity that is characteristic of perceptions: the top part of the mirror represents the top part of my body, and so on.  The representation of my body in the mirror is merely a collection of smaller representations, without any genuine unity.  When another person perceives my body, on the other hand, her representation of my body is a unified whole.  No physical thing can do better than the mirror in this respect: the only way material things can represent anything is through the arrangement or properties of their parts.  As a result, any such representation will be spread out over multiple parts of the representing material object and hence lack genuine unity.  It is arguably for this reason that Leibniz defines ‘perception’ as “the passing state which involves and represents a multitude in the unity or in the simple substance” (Monadology, section 14).

Leibniz’s mill argument, then, relies on a particular understanding of perception and of material objects.  Because all material objects are complex and because perceptions require unity, material objects cannot possibly perceive.  Any representation a machine, or a material object, could produce would lack the unity required for perception.  The mill example is supposed to illustrate this: even an extremely small machine, if it is purely material, works only in virtue of the arrangement of its parts.  Hence, it is always possible, at least in principle, to enlarge the machine.  When we imagine the machine thus enlarged, that is, when we imagine being able to distinguish the machine’s parts as we can distinguish the parts of a mill, we will realize that the machine cannot possibly have genuine perceptions.

Yet the basic idea behind Leibniz’s mill argument can be appealing even to those of us who do not share Leibniz’s assumptions about perception and material objects.  In fact, it appears to be a more general version of what is today called “the hard problem of consciousness," that is, the problem of explaining how something physical could explain, or give rise to, consciousness.  While Leibniz’s mill argument is about perception generally, rather than conscious perception in particular, the underlying structure of the argument appears to be similar: mental states have characteristics—such as their unity or their phenomenal properties—that, it seems, cannot even in principle be explained physically.  There is an explanatory gap between the physical and the mental.

4. The Relation between Mind and Body

The mind-body problem is a central issue in the philosophy of mind.  It is, roughly, the problem of explaining how mind and body can causally interact.  That they interact seems exceedingly obvious: my mental states, such as for instance my desire for a cold drink, do seem capable of producing changes in my body, such as the bodily motions required for walking to the fridge and retrieving a bottle of water.  Likewise, certain physical states seem capable of producing changes in my mind: when I stub my toe on my way to the fridge, for instance, this event in my body appears to cause me pain, which is a mental state.  For Descartes and his followers, it is notoriously difficult to explain how mind and body causally interact.  After all, Cartesians are substance dualists: they believe that mind and body are substances of a radically different type (see Descartes: Mind-Body Distinction).  How could a mental state such as a desire cause a physical state such as a bodily motion, or vice versa, if mind and body have absolutely nothing in common?  This is the version of the mind-body problem that Cartesians face.

For Leibniz, the mind-body problem does not arise in exactly the way it arises for Descartes and his followers, because Leibniz is not a substance dualist.  We have already seen that, according to Leibniz, an animal or human being has a central monad, which constitutes its soul, as well as subordinate monads that are everywhere in its body.  In fact, Leibniz appears to hold that the body just is the collection of these subordinate monads and their perceptions (see e.g. Principles of Nature and Grace section 3), or that bodies result from monads (Ariew and Garber, p. 179).  After all, as already seen, he holds that purely material, extended things would not only be incapable of perception, but would also not be real because of their infinite divisibility.  The only truly real things, for Leibniz, are monads, that is, immaterial and indivisible substances.  This means that Leibniz, unlike Descartes, does not believe that there are two fundamentally different kinds of substances, namely physical and mental substances.  Instead, for Leibniz, all substances are of the same general type.  As a result, the mind-body problem may seem more tractable for Leibniz: if bodies have a semi-mental nature, there are fewer obvious obstacles to claiming that bodies and minds can interact with one another.

Yet, for complicated reasons that are beyond the scope of this article (but see Leibniz: Causation), Leibniz held that human minds and their bodies—as well as any created substances, in fact—cannot causally interact.  In this, he agrees with occasionalists such as Nicolas Malebranche.  Leibniz departs from occasionalists, however, in his positive account of the relation between mental and corresponding bodily events.  Occasionalists hold that God needs to intervene in nature constantly to establish this correspondence.  When I decide to move my foot, for instance, God intervenes and moves my foot accordingly, occasioned by my decision.  Leibniz, however, thinks that such interventions would constitute perpetual miracles and be unworthy of a God who always acts in the most perfect manner.  God arranged things so perfectly, Leibniz contends, that there is no need for these divine interventions.  Even though he endorses the traditional theological doctrine that God continually conserves all creatures in existence and concurs with their actions (see Leibniz: Causation), Leibniz stresses that all natural events in the created world are caused and made intelligible by the natures of created things.  In other words, Leibniz rejects the occasionalist doctrine that God is the only active, efficient cause, and that the laws of nature that govern natural events are merely God’s intentions to move his creatures around in a particular way.  Instead for Leibniz these laws, or God’s decrees about the ways in which created things should behave, are written into the natures of these creatures.  God not only decided how creatures should act, but also gave them natures and natural powers from which these actions follow.  To understand the regularities and events in nature, we do not need to look beyond the natures of creatures.  This, Leibniz claims, is much more worthy of a perfect God than the occasionalist world, in which natural events are not internally intelligible.

How, then, does Leibniz explain the correspondence between mental and bodily states if he denies that there is genuine causal interaction among finite things and also denies that God brings about the correspondence by constantly intervening?  Consider again the example in which I decide to get a drink from the fridge and my body executes that decision.  It may seem that unless there is a fairly direct link between my decision and the action—either a link supplied by God’s intervention, or by the power of my mind to cause bodily motion—it would be an enormous coincidence that my body carries out my decision.  Yet, Leibniz thinks there is a third option, which he calls ‘pre-established harmony.’  On this view, God created my body and my mind in such a way that they naturally, but without any direct causal links, correspond to one another.  God knew, before he created my body, that I would decide to get a cold drink, and hence made my body in such a way that it will, in virtue of its own nature, walk to the fridge and get a bottle of water right after my mind makes that decision.

In one text, Leibniz provides a helpful analogy for his doctrine of pre-established harmony.  Imagine two pendulum clocks that are in perfect agreement for a long period of time.  There are three ways to ensure this kind of correspondence between them: (a) establishing a causal link, such as a connection between the pendulums of these clocks, (b) asking a person constantly to synchronize the two clocks, and (c) designing and constructing these clocks so perfectly that they will remain perfectly synchronized without any causal links or adjustments (see Ariew and Garber, pp. 147-148).  Option (c), Leibniz contends, is superior to the other two options, and it is in this way that God ensures that the states of my mind correspond to the states of my body, or in fact, that the perceptions of any created substance harmonize with the perceptions of any other.  The world is arranged and designed so perfectly that events in one substance correspond to events in another substance even though they do not causally interact, and even though God does not intervene to adjust one to the other.  Because of his infinite wisdom and foreknowledge, God was able to pre-establish this mutual correspondence or harmony when he created the world, analogously to the way a skilled clockmaker can construct two clocks that perfectly correspond to one another for a period of time.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources in English Translation

  • Ariew, Roger and Daniel Garber, eds. Philosophical Essays. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
    • Contains translations of many of Leibniz’s most important shorter writings such as the Monadology, the Principles of Nature and Grace, the Discourse on Metaphysics, and excerpts from Leibniz’s correspondence, to name just a few.
  • Ariew, Roger, ed.  Correspondence [between Leibniz and Clarke]. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2000.
    • A translation of Leibniz’s correspondence with Samuel Clarke, which touches on many important topics in metaphysics and philosophy of mind.
  • Francks, Richard and Roger S. Woolhouse, eds. Leibniz's 'New System' and Associated Contemporary Texts. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Francks, Richard and Roger S. Woolhouse, eds. Philosophical Texts. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Huggard, E. M., ed. Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man and the Origin of Evil. La Salle: Open Court, 1985.
    • Translation of the only philosophical monograph Leibniz published in his lifetime, which contains many important discussions of free will.
  • Lodge, Paul, ed. The Leibniz–De Volder Correspondence: With Selections from the Correspondence between Leibniz and Johann Bernoulli. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2013.
    • An edition, with English translations, of Leibniz’s correspondence with De Volder, which is a very important source of information about Leibniz’s mature metaphysics.
  • Loemker, Leroy E., ed. Philosophical Papers and Letters. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1970.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Look, Brandon and Donald Rutherford, eds. The Leibniz–Des Bosses Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2007.
    • An edition, with English translations, of Leibniz’s correspondence with Des Bosses, which is another important source of information about Leibniz’s mature metaphysics.
  • Parkinson, George Henry Radcliffe and Mary Morris, eds. Philosophical Writings. London: Everyman, 1973.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Remnant, Peter and Jonathan Francis Bennett, eds. New Essays on Human Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • Translation of Leibniz’s section-by-section response to Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding, written in the form of a dialogue between the two fictional characters Philalethes and Theophilus, who represent Locke’s and Leibniz’s views, respectively.
  • Rescher, Nicholas, ed. G.W. Leibniz's Monadology: An Edition for Students. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1991.
    • An edition, with English translation, of the Monadology, with commentary and a useful collection of parallel passages from other Leibniz texts.
  • Strickland, Lloyd H., ed. The Shorter Leibniz Texts: A Collection of New Translations. London: Continuum, 2006.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
    • One of the most influential and rigorous works on Leibniz’s metaphysics.
  • Borst, Clive. "Leibniz and the Compatibilist Account of Free Will." Studia Leibnitiana 24.1 (1992): 49-58.
    • About Leibniz’s views on free will.
  • Brandom, Robert. "Leibniz and Degrees of Perception." Journal of the History of Philosophy 19 (1981): 447-79.
    • About Leibniz’s views on perception and perceptual distinctness.
  • Davidson, Jack. "Imitators of God: Leibniz on Human Freedom." Journal of the History of Philosophy 36.3 (1998): 387-412.
    • Another helpful article about Leibniz’s views on free will and on the ways in which human freedom resembles divine freedom.
  • Davidson, Jack. "Leibniz on Free Will." The Continuum Companion to Leibniz. Ed. Brandon Look. London: Continuum, 2011. 208-222.
    • Accessible general introduction to Leibniz’s views on freedom of the will.
  • Duncan, Stewart. "Leibniz's Mill Argument Against Materialism." Philosophical Quarterly 62.247 (2011): 250-72.
    • Helpful discussion of Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • Garber, Daniel. Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • A thorough study of the development of Leibniz’s metaphysical views.
  • Gennaro, Rocco J. "Leibniz on Consciousness and Self-Consciousness." New Essays on the Rationalists. Eds. Rocco J. Gennaro and C. Huenemann. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. 353-371.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s views on consciousness and highlights the advantages of reading Leibniz as endorsing a higher-order thought theory of consciousness.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. Leibniz. London; New York: Routledge, 2005.
    • Good general introduction to Leibniz’s philosophy; includes chapters on the mind and freedom.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "Leibniz on Memory and Consciousness." British Journal for the History of Philosophy 19.5 (2011a): 887-916.
    • Elaborates on Jorgensen (2009) and discusses the role of memory in Leibniz’s theory of consciousness.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "Mind the Gap: Reflection and Consciousness in Leibniz." Studia Leibnitiana 43.2 (2011b): 179-95.
    • About Leibniz’s account of reflection and reasoning.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "The Principle of Continuity and Leibniz's Theory of Consciousness." Journal of the History of Philosophy 47.2 (2009): 223-48.
    • Argues against ascribing a higher-order theory of consciousness to Leibniz.
  • Kulstad, Mark. Leibniz on Apperception, Consciousness, and Reflection. Munich: Philosophia, 1991.
    • Influential, meticulous study of Leibniz’s views on consciousness.
  • Kulstad, Mark. "Leibniz, Animals, and Apperception." Studia Leibnitiana 13 (1981): 25-60.
    • A shorter discussion of some of the issues in Kulstad (1991).
  • Lodge, Paul, and Marc E. Bobro. "Stepping Back Inside Leibniz's Mill." The Monist 81.4 (1998): 553-72.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • Lodge, Paul. "Leibniz's Mill Argument Against Mechanical Materialism Revisited." Ergo (2014).
    • Further discussion of Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • McRae, Robert. Leibniz: Perception, Apperception, and Thought. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1976.
    • An important and still helpful, even if somewhat dated, study of Leibniz’s philosophy of mind.
  • Murray, Michael J. "Spontaneity and Freedom in Leibniz." Leibniz: Nature and Freedom. Eds. Donald Rutherford and Jan A. Cover. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005. 194-216.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s views on free will and self-determination, or spontaneity.
  • Phemister, Pauline. "Leibniz, Freedom of Will and Rationality." Studia Leibnitiana 26.1 (1991): 25-39.
    • Explores the connections between rationality and freedom in Leibniz.
  • Rozemond, Marleen. "Leibniz on the Union of Body and Soul." Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 79.2 (1997): 150-78.
    • About the mind-body problem and pre-established harmony in Leibniz.
  • Rozemond, Marleen. "Mills Can't Think: Leibniz's Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Res Philosophica 91.1 (2014): 1-28.
    • Another helpful discussion of the mill argument.
  • Savile, Anthony. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Leibniz and the Monadology. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Very accessible introduction to Leibniz’s Monadology.
  • Simmons, Alison. "Changing the Cartesian Mind: Leibniz on Sensation, Representation and Consciousness." The Philosophical Review 110.1 (2001): 31-75.
    • Insightful discussion of the ways in which Leibniz’s philosophy of mind differs from the Cartesian view; also argues that Leibnizian consciousness consists in higher-order perceptions.
  • Sotnak, Eric. "The Range of Leibnizian Compatibilism." New Essays on the Rationalists. Eds. Rocco J. Gennaro and C. Huenemann. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. 200-223.
    • About Leibniz’s theory of freedom.
  • Swoyer, Chris. "Leibnizian Expression." Journal of the History of Philosophy 33 (1995): 65-99.
    • About Leibnizian perception.
  • Wilson, Margaret Dauler. "Confused Vs. Distinct Perception in Leibniz: Consciousness, Representation, and God's Mind." Ideas and Mechanism: Essays on Early Modern Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1999. 336-352.
    • About Leibnizian perception as well as perceptual distinctness.

 

Author Information

Julia Jorati
Email: jorati.1@osu.edu
The Ohio State University
U. S. A.

Kwasi Wiredu (1931- )

Kwasi Wiredu is a philosopher from Ghana, who has for decades been involved with a project he terms “conceptual decolonization” in contemporary African systems of thought.  By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two aims.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavory aspects of tribal culture embedded in modern African thought so as to make that thought more viable.  Second, he intends to dislodge unnecessary Western epistemologies that are to be found in African philosophical practices.

In previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topical issue both at the highest theoretical levels and also at the basic level of everyday existence. After African countries attained political liberation, decolonization became an immediate and overwhelming preoccupation.  A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways.  The disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature, and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic conundrums of decolonization.

A central purpose in this article is to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophy in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In this light, it sometimes appears that African philosophy has been quite limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization has been rightly conceived as a vast, global, and trans-disciplinary enterprise.

This analysis involves an examination of both the limitations and immense possibilities of Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization.  First, the article offers a close reading of the theory itself and then locates it within the broader movement of modern African thought.  In several instances, Wiredu’s theory has proved seminal to the advancement of contemporary African philosophical practices.  It is also necessary to be aware of current imperatives of globalization, nationality, and territoriality and how they affect the agency of a theory such as ideological/conceptual decolonization.  Indeed, the notion of decolonization is far more complex than is often assumed.  Consequently, the epistemological resources by which it can be apprehended as a concept, ideology, or process are multiple and diverse.  Lastly, this article, as a whole, represents a reflection on the diversity of the dimensions of decolonization.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Early Beginnings
  3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice
  4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development
  5. An African Reading of Karl Marx
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Kwasi Wiredu is one of Africa’s foremost philosophers, and he has done a great deal to establish the discipline of philosophy, in its contemporary shape, as a credible area of intellection in most parts of the African continent and beyond.  In order to appreciate the conceptual and historical contexts of his work, it is necessary to possess some familiarity with relevant discourses in African studies and history, anthropology, literature and postcolonial theory, particularly those advanced by Edward W. Said, Gayatri Spivak, Homi Bhabha, Abiola Irele and Biodun Jeyifo.  Wiredu’s contribution to the making of modern African thought provides an interesting insight into the processes involved in the formation of postcolonial disciplines and discourses, and it can also be conceived as a counter-articulation to the hegemonic discourses of imperial domination.

 Wiredu, for many decades, was involved with a project he termed conceptual decolonization in contemporary African systems of thought. This term entailed, for Wiredu, a re-examination of current African epistemic foundations in order to accomplish two main objectives.  First, he intended to undermine counter-productive facets of tribal cultures embedded in modern African, thought so as to make this body of thought both more sustainable and more rational.  Second, he intended to deconstruct the unnecessary Western epistemologies which may be found in African philosophical practices.

A broad spectrum of academic disciplines took up the conceptual challenges of decolonization in a variety of ways. In particular, the disciplines of anthropology, history, political science, literature and philosophy all grappled with the practical and academic challenges inherent to decolonization.

It is usually profitable to examine the contributions and limitations of African philosophers comparatively (along with other African thinkers who are not professional philosophers) in relation to the history of the debate on decolonization.  In addition to the scholars noted above, the discourse of decolonialization has benefitted from many valuable contributions made by intellectuals such as Frantz Fanon, Leopold Sedar Senghor, Cheikh Anta Diop, and Ngugi wa Thiongo.  In this light, it would appear that African philosophy has been, at certain moments, limited in defining the horizons of the debate when compared with the achievements of academic specialties such as literature, postcolonial theory and cultural studies. Thus, decolonization, as Ngugi wa Thiongo, the Kenyan cultural theorist and novelist, notes, must be conceived as a broad, transcontinental, and multidisciplinary venture.

Within the Anglophone contingent of African philosophy, the analytic tradition of British philosophy continues to be dominant.  This discursive hegemony had led an evident degree of parochialism.  This in turn has led to the neglect of many other important intellectual traditions.  For instance, within this Anglophonic sphere, there is not always a systematic interrogation of the limits, excesses and uses of colonialist anthropology in formulating the problematic of identity.  In this regard, the problematic of identity does not only refer to the question of personal agency but more broadly, the challenges of discursive identity.  This shortcoming is not as evident in Francophone traditions of African philosophy, which usually highlight the foundational discursive interactions between anthropology and modern African thought.  Thus, in this instance, there is an opening to other discursive formations necessary for the nurturing a vibrant philosophical practice.  Also, within Anglophone African philosophy, a stringent critique of imperialism and contemporary globalization does not always figure is not always significantly in the substance of the discourse, thereby further underlining the drawbacks of parochialism.  As such, it is necessary for critiques of Wiredu’s corpus to move beyond its ostensible frame to include critiques and discussions of traditions of philosophical practice outside the Anglophone divide of modern African thought (Osha, 2005).  Accordingly, such critiques ought not merely be a celebration of post-structuralist discourses to the detriment of African intellectual traditions.  Instead, they should be, among other things, an exploration of the discursive intimacies between the Anglophone and Francophone traditions of African philosophy.  In addition, an interrogation of other borders of philosophy is required to observe the gains that might accrue to the Anglophone movement of contemporary African philosophy, which, in many ways, has reached a discursive dead-end due to its inability to surmount the intractable problematic of identity, and its endless preoccupation with the question of its origins. These are the sort of interrogations that readings of Wiredu’s work necessitate. Furthermore, a study of Wiredu’s corpus (Osha, 2005) identifies—if only obliquely—the necessity to re-assess the importance of other discourses such as colonialist anthropology and various philosophies of black subjectivity in the formation of the modern African subject.  These are some of the central concerns which appear in Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa (2005).

2. Early Beginnings

Kwasi Wiredu was born in 1931 in Ghana and had his first exposure to philosophy quite early in life.  He read his first couple of books of philosophy in school around 1947 in Kumasi, the capital of Ashanti.  These books were Bernard Bosanquet’s The Essentials of Logic and C.E.M. Joad’s Teach Yourself Philosophy.  Logic, as a branch of philosophy attracted Wiredu because of its affinities to grammar, which he enjoyed.  He was also fond of practical psychology during the formative years of his life.  In 1950, whilst vacationing with his aunt in Accra, the capital of Ghana, he came across another philosophical text which influenced him tremendously.  The text was The Last Days of Socrates which had the following four dialogues by Plato: The Apology, Euthyphro, Meno and Crito. These dialogues were to influence, in a significant way, the final chapter of his first groundbreaking philosophical text, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) which is also dialogic in structure.

He was admitted into the University of Ghana, Legon in 1952, to read philosophy, but before attending he started to study the thought of John Dewey on his own. However, mention must be made of the fact that C. E. M. Joad’s philosophy had a particularly powerful effect on him. Indeed, he employed the name J. E. Joad as his pen-name for a series of political articles he wrote for a national newspaper, The Ashanti Sentinel between 1950 and1951.  At the University of Ghana, he was instructed mainly in Western philosophy and he came to find out about African traditions of thought more or less through his own individual efforts.  He was later to admit that the character of his undergraduate education was to leave his mind a virtual tabula rasa, as far as African philosophy was concerned.  In other words, he had to develop and maintain his interests in African philosophy on his own. One of the first texts of African philosophy that he read was J. B. Danquah’s Akan Doctrine of God: A Fragment of Gold Coast Ethics and Religion.  Undoubtedly, his best friend William Abraham, who went a year before him to Oxford University, must have also influenced the direction of his philosophical research towards African thought.  A passage from an interview explains the issue of his institutional relation to African philosophy:

Prior to 1985, when I was in Africa, I devoted most of my time in almost equal proportions to research in African philosophy and in other areas of philosophy, such as the philosophy of logic, in which not much has, or is generally known to have, been done in African philosophy.  I did not have always to be teaching African philosophy or giving public lectures in African philosophy. There were others who were also competent to teach the subject and give talks in our Department of Philosophy.  But since I came to the United States, I have often been called upon to teach or talk about African philosophy.  I have therefore spent much more time than before researching in that area. This does not mean that I have altogether ignored my earlier interests, for indeed, I continue to teach subjects like (Western) logic and epistemology (Wiredu in Oladiop 2002: 332).

Wiredu began publishing relatively late, but has been exceedingly prolific ever since he started. During the early to mid 1970s, he often published as many as six major papers per year on topics ranging from logic, to epistemology, to African systems of thought, in reputable international journals.  His first major book, Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) is truly remarkable for its eclectic range of interests.  Paulin Hountondji, Wiredu’s great contemporary from the Republic of Benin, for many years had to deal with charges that his philosophically impressive corpus lacked ideological content and therefore merit from critics such as Olabiyi Yai (1977).  Hountondji (1983; 2002) in those times of extreme ideologizing, never avoided the required measure of socialist posturing.  Wiredu, on the other hand, not only avoided the lure of socialism but went on to denounce it as an unfit ideology.  Within the context of the socio-political moment of that era, it seemed a reactionary—even injurious—posture to adopt.  Nonetheless, he had not only laid the foundations of his project of conceptual decolonization at the theoretical level but had also begun to explore its various practical implications by his analyses of concepts such as “truth,” and also by his focused critique of some of the more counter-productive impacts of both colonialism and traditional culture.

By conceptual decolonization, Wiredu advocates a re-examination of current African epistemic formations in order to accomplish two objectives.  First, he wishes to subvert unsavoury aspects of indigenous traditions embedded in modern African thought so as to make it more viable.  Second, he intends to undermine the unhelpful Western epistemologies to be found in African philosophical traditions. On this important formulation of his he states:

By this I mean the purging of African philosophical thinking of all uncritical assimilation of Western ways of thinking. That, of course, would be only part of the battle won. The other desiderata are the careful study of our own traditional philosophies and the synthesising of any insights obtained from that source with any other insights that might be gained from the intellectual resources of the modern world.  In my opinion, it is only by such a reflective integration of the traditional and the modern that contemporary African philosophers can contribute to the flourishing of our peoples and, ultimately, all other peoples. (Oladipo, 2002: 328)

In spite of his invaluable contributions to modern African thought, it can be argued that Wiredu’s schema falls short as a feasible long term epistemic project.  Due to the hybridity of the postcolonial condition, projects seeking to retrieve the precolonial heritage are bound to be marred at several levels.  It would be an error for Wiredu or advocates of his project of conceptual decolonization to attempt to universalize his theory since, as Ngugi wa Thiongo argues, decolonization is a vast, global enterprise.  Rather, it is safer to read Wiredu’s project as a way of articulating theoretical presence for the de-agentialized and deterritorialized contemporary African subject.  In many ways, his project resembles those of Ngugi wa Thiongo and Cheikh Anta Diop.  Ngugi wa Thiongo advocates cultural and linguistic decolonization on a global scale and his theory has undergone very little transformation since its formulation in the 1960s.  Diop advances a similar set of ideas to Wiredu on the subject of vibrant modern African identities. Wiredu’s project is linked in conceptual terms to the broader project of political decolonization as advanced by liberationist African leaders such as Julius Nyerere, Jomo Kenyatta, Kwame Nkrumah, and Nnamdi Azikiwe.  But what distinguishes the particular complexion of his theory is its links with the Anglo-Saxon analytic tradition. This dimension is important in differentiating his project from those of his equally illustrious contemporaries such as V. Y. Mudimbe and Paulin Hountondji.  In fact, it can be argued that Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization has more similarities with Ngugi wa Thiongo’s ideas regarding African cultural and linguistic agency than Mudimbe’s archeological excavations of African traces in Western historical and anthropological texts.

3. Decolonization as Epistemological Practice

In all previously colonized regions of the world, decolonization remains a topic of considerable academic interest.  Wiredu’s theory of conceptual decolonization is essentially what defines his attitudes and gestures towards the content of contemporary African thought.  Also it is an insight that is inflected by years of immersion into British analytic philosophy.  Wiredu began his reflections of the nature, legitimate aims, and possible orientations in contemporary African thought not as a result of any particular awareness of the trauma or violence of colonialism or imperialism but by a confrontation with the dilemma of modernity by the reflective (post)colonial African consciousness.  This dialectic origin can be contrasted with those of his contemporaries such as Paulin Hountondji and V. Y. Mudimbe.

Despite criticisms regarding some aspects of his work, in terms of founding a tradition for the practice of modern African philosophy, Wiredu’s contributions have been pivotal. He has also been very consistent in his output and the quality of his reflections regardless of some of their more obvious limitations.

As noted earlier, Wiredu was trained in a particular tradition of Western philosophy: the analytic tradition.  This fact is reflected in his corpus.  A major charge held against him is that his contributions could be made even richer if he had grappled with other relevant discourses: postcolonial theory, African feminisms, contemporary Afrocentric discourses and the global dimensions of projects and discourses of decolonization.

Kwasi Wiredu’s interests and philosophical importance are certainly not limited to conceptual decolonization alone.  He has offered some useful insights on Marxism, mysticism, metaphysics, and the general nature of the philosophical enterprise itself. Although his latter text, Cultural Universals and Particulars has a more Africa-centred orientation, his first book, Philosophy and an African Culture presents a wider range of discursive interests: a vigorous critique of Marxism, reflections on the phenomenon of ideology, analyses of truth and the philosophy of language, among other preoccupations. It is interesting to see how Wiredu weaves together these different preoccupations and also to observe how some of them have endured while others have not.

The volume Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy is an apt summation of Wiredu’s philosophical interests with a decidedly African problematic while his landmark philosophical work, Philosophy and an African Culture, published first in 1980, should serve as a fertile source for more detailed elucidation.

In the second essay of Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy entitled “The Need for Conceptual Decolonisation in African Philosophy”, Wiredu writes that “with an even greater sense of urgency the intervening decade does not seem to have brought any indications of a widespread realization of the need for conceptual decolonisation in African philosophy” (Wiredu, 1995: 23).  The intention at this juncture is to examine some of the ways in which Wiredu has been involved in the daunting task of conceptual decolonization.  Decolonization itself is a problematic exercise because it necessitates the jettisoning of certain conceptual attitudes that inform one’s worldviews.  Secondly, it usually entails an attempt at the retrieval of a more or less fragmented historical heritage.  Decolonization in Fanon’s conception entails this necessity for all colonized peoples and, in addition, it is “a programme of complete disorder” (Fanon, 1963:20).  This understanding is purely political and has therefore, a practical import.  This is not to say that Fanon had no plan for the project of decolonization in the intellectual sphere.  Also associated with this project as it was then conceived was a struggle for the mental liberation of the colonized African peoples.  It was indeed a program of violence in more senses than one.

However, with Wiredu, there isn’t an outright endorsement of violence, as decolonization in this instance amounts to conceptual subversion.  As a logical consequence, it is necessary to stress the difference between Fanon’s conception of decolonization and Wiredu’s.  Fanon is sometimes regarded as belonging to the same philosophical persuasion that harbours figures like Nkrumah, Senghor, Nyerere and Sekou Toure, “the philosopher-kings of early post-independence Africa” (Wiredu,1995:14), as Wiredu calls them.  This is so because they had to live out the various dramas of existence and the struggles for self and collective identity at more or less the same colonial/postcolonial moment.  Those “spiritual uncles” of professional African philosophers were engaged, as Wiredu states, in a strictly political struggle, and whatever philosophical insight they possessed was put at the disposal of this struggle, instead of a merely theoretical endeavour.  Obviously, Fanon was the most astute theoretician of decolonization of the lot.  In addition, for Fanon and the so-called philosopher-kings, decolonization was invested with a pan-African mandate and political appeal.  This crucial difference should be noted alongside what shall soon be demonstrated to be the Wiredu conception of decolonization.  Africans, generally, will have to continue to ponder the entire issue of decolonization as long as unsolved questions of identity remain and the challenges of collective development linger.  This type of challenge was foreseen by Fanon.

The end of colonialism in Africa and other Third World countries did not entail the end of imperialism and the dominance of the metropolitan countries.  Instead, the dynamics of dominance assumed a more complex, if subtle, form.  African economic systems floundered alongside African political institutions, and, as a result, various crises have compounded the seemingly perennial issue of underdevelopment.

A significant portion of post-colonial theory involves the entry of Third World scholars into the Western archive, as it were, with the intention of dislodging the erroneous epistemological assumptions and structures regarding their peoples.  This, arguably, is another variant of decolonization.  Wiredu partakes of this type of activity, but sometimes he carries the program even further.  Accordingly, he affirms:

Until Africa can have a lingua franca, we will have to communicate suitable parts of our work in our multifarious vernaculars, and in other forms of popular discourse, while using the metropolitan languages for international communication. (Wiredu, 1995:20)

This conviction has been a guiding principle with Wiredu for several years.  In fact, it is not merely a conviction; there are several instances within the broad spectrum of his philosophical corpus where he tries to put it into practice.  Two of such attempts are his essays “The Concept of Truth in the Akan Language” and “The Akan Concept of Mind.”  In the first of these articles, Wiredu states “there is no one word in Akan for truth” (Wiredu, 1985:46).  Similarly, he writes, “another linguistic contrast between Akan and English is that there is no word “fact” (Ibid.).  It is necessary to cite the central thesis of the essay; Wiredu writes that he wants “to make a metadoctrinal point which reflection on the African language enables us to see, which is that a theory of truth is not of any real universal significance unless it offers some account of the notion of being so” (Ibid.).

Wiredu’s argument here, needs to be firmer.  In many respects, he is only comparing component parts of the English language with the Akan language and not always with a view to drawing out “any real universal significance” as he says.  The entire approach seems to be irrevocably restrictive.  This is the distinction that lies between an oral culture and a textual one.  Most African intellectuals usually gloss over this difference, even though they may acknowledge it.  The difference is indeed very significant, because of the numerous imponderables that come into play.  Abiola Irele has been able to demonstrate the tremendous significance of orality in the constitution of modern African forms of literary expression.

However, Wiredu is more convincing in his essay “Democracy and Consensus in African Traditional Politics: A Plea for a Non-Party Polity”.  In this essay, Wiredu argues that the:

Ashanti system was a consensual democracy. It was a democracy because government was by the consent, and subject to the control, of the people as expressed through the representatives. It was consensual because, at least, as a rule, that consent was negotiated on the principle of consensus. (By contrast, the majoritarian system might be said to be, in principle, based on consent without consensus.) (Ibid. pp58-59)

When Wiredu broaches the issue of politics and its present and future contexts in postcolonial Africa, then we are compelled to visit a whole range of debates and discourses especially in the social sciences in Africa.  These arearguably more directly concerned with questions pertaining to governance, democracy, and the challenges of contemporary globalization.

Another essay by Wiredu, entitled “The Akan Concept of Mind” is also an attempt of conceptual recontextualization.  Wiredu begins by stating that he is restricting himself to a study of the Akans of Ghana in order “to keep the discussion within reasonable anthropological bounds” (Wiredu, 1983:113).  His objective is a modest but nevertheless important one, since it fits quite well with his entire philosophical project which, as noted, is concerned with ironing out philosophical issues “on independent grounds” and possibly in one’s own language and the metropolitan language bequeathed by the colonial heritage.

It is therefore appropriate to proceed gradually, traversing the problematic interfaces between various languages in search of satisfactory structures of meaning.  The immediate effect is a radical diminishing of the entire concept of African philosophy, a term which under these circumstances would become even more problematic.  The consequence of Wiredu’s position is that to arrive at the essence of African philosophy, it would be necessary to dismantle its monolithic structure to make it more context-bound.  First, Africa as a spatial entity would require further re-drawing of its often problematic geography.  Second, a new thematics to mediate between the general and the particular would have to be found.  Third, the critique of unanimism and ethnophilosophy would be driven into more contested terrains.  These are some of the likely challenges posed by Wiredu’s approach.

Furthermore, in dealing with the traditional Akan conceptual system, or any other, for that matter, it should be borne in mind that what is in contention is “a folk philosophy, a body of originally unwritten ideas preserved in the oral traditions, customs and usages of a people” (Ibid.).

It would be appropriate to examine more closely his article “The Akan Concept of Mind”.  Here, Wiredu enumerates the ways in which the English conception of mind differs markedly from that of the Akan, due in a large part to certain fundamental linguistic dissimilarities.  He also makes the point that “the Akans most certainly do not regard mind as one of the entities that go to constitute a person” (Ibid. 121).  It is significant to note this, but at the same time, it is difficult to imagine the ultimate viability of this approach.  Indeed after reformulating traditional Western philosophical problems to suit African conditions, it remains to be seen how African epistemological claims can be substantiated using the natural and logical procedures available to African systems of thought.  As such, it is possible to argue that this conceptual manoeuvre would eventually degenerate into a dead-end of epistemic nativism.  These are the kinds of issues raised by Wiredu’s project.

As such, inherent in the thrust for complete decolonization is the presence of colonial violence itself.  In addition, there is essentially a latent desire for epistemic violence, as well as difficulties concerning the negotiation of linguistic divides. In the following quotation, for example, Wiredu attempts to demonstrate the significance of some of those differences:

By comparison with the conflation of concepts of mind and soul prevalent in Western philosophy, the Akan separation of the “Okra” from “adwene” suggests a more analytical awareness of the sanctification of human personality. (Ibid.128)

It is necessary to substantiate more rigorously claims such as this because we may also be committing an error in establishing certain troublesome linguistic or philosophical correspondences between two disparate cultures and traditions.

Another crucial, if distressing, feature of decolonization as advanced by Wiredu is that it always has to measure itself up with the colonizing Other, that is, it finds it almost impossible to create its own image so to speak by the employment of autochthonous strategies.  This is not to assert that decolonization always has to avail itself of indigenous procedures, but the very concept of decolonization is in fact concerned with breaking away from imperial structures of dominance in order to express a will to self-identity or presence.  To be sure, the Other is always present, defacing all claims to full presence of the decolonizing subject.  This is a contradictory but inevitable trope within the postcolonial condition.  The Other is always there to present the criteria by which self-identity is adjudged either favourably or unfavourably. There is no getting around the Other as it is introduced in its own latent and covert violence, in the hesitant counter-violence of the decolonizing subject and invariably in the counter-articulations of all projects of decolonization.

4. Tradition, Modernity and the Challenges of Development

Wiredu’s later attempts at conceptual decolonization have been quite interesting.  An example of such an attempt is the essay “Custom and Morality: A Comparative Analysis of some African and Western Conceptions of Morals.”  He is able to explore at greater length some of the conceptual confusions that arise as a result of the transplantation of Western ideas within an African frame of reference.  This wholesale transference of foreign ideas and conceptual models has caused the occurrence of severe cases of identity crises and, to borrow a more apposite term, colonial mentality.  Indeed, one of the aims of Wiredu’s efforts at conceptual decolonization is to indicate instances of colonial mentality and determine strategies by which they can be minimized.  Accordingly he is quite convincing when he argues that polygamy in a traditional setting amounts to efficient social thinking but is most inappropriate within a modern framework.  In this way, Wiredu is offering a critique of a certain traditional practice that ought to be discarded on account of the demands and realities of a modern economy.

On another level, it appears that Wiredu has not sufficiently interrogated the distance between orality and textuality.  If indeed he has done so, he would be rather more skeptical about the manner in which he thinks he can dislodge certain Western philosophical structures embedded in the African consciousness.

Wiredu has always believed that traditional modes of thought and folk philosophies should be interpreted, clarified, analyzed and subjected to critical evaluation and assimilation (Wiredu, 1980: x).  Also, at the beginning of his philosophical reflections, he puts forth the crucial formulation that there is no reason why the African philosopher “in his philosophical meditations […] should not test formulations in those against intuitions in his own language” (Wiredu, 1980: xi).  And, rather than merely discussing the possibilities for evolving modern traditions in African philosophy, African philosophers should actually begin to do so (Hountondji, 1983).  In carrying out this task, the African philosopher has a few available methodological approaches.  First, he is urged to “acquaint himself with the different philosophies of the different cultures of the world, not to be encylopaedic or eclectic, but with the aim of trying to see how far issues and concepts of universal relevance can be disentangled from the contingencies of culture” (Wiredu, 1980: 31).  He also adds that “the African philosopher has no choice but to conduct his philosophical inquiries in relation to the philosophical writings of other peoples, for his ancestors left him no heritage of philosophical writings” (Wiredu, 1980: 48).  For Wiredu, the use of translations is a fundamental aspect of contemporary African philosophical practices.  However, on the dilemmas of translation in the current age of neoliberalism, it has been noted: “translations are [..] put ‘out of joint.’  However correct or legitimate they may be, and whatever right one may acknowledge them to have, they are all disadjusted, as it were unjust in the gap that affects them.  This gap is within them, to be sure, because their meanings remain necessarily equivocal; next it is in the relation among them and thus their multiplicity, and finally or first of all in the irreducible inadequation to the other language and to the stroke of genius of the event that makes the law, to all the virtualities of the original” (Derrida, 1994:19).  Wiredu does not contemplate the implications of this kind of indictment in his formulations of an approach to African philosophy.  Perhaps the task at hand is simply too important and demanding to cater to such philosophical niceties.  In relation to the kind of philosophical heritage at the disposal of the African philosopher, Wiredu identifies three main strands; “a folk philosophy, a written traditional philosophy and a modern philosophy” (Wiredu, 1980:46).  Wiredu’s approach to questions of this sort is embedded in his general theoretical stance: “It is a function, indeed a duty, of philosophy in any society to examine the intellectual foundations of its culture.  For any such examination to be of any real use, it should take the form of reasoned criticism and, where possible, reconstruction. No other way to philosophical progress is known than through criticism and adaptation” (Wiredu, 1980: 20).

The drive to attain progress is not limited to philosophical discourse alone.  Entire communities and cultures usually aim to improve upon their institutions and practices in order to remain relevant.  Societies can lose the momentum of growth and “various habits of thought and practice can become anachronistic within the context of the development of a given society; but an entire society too can become anachronistic within the context of the whole world if the ways of life within it are predominantly anachronistic.  In the latter case, of course, there is no discarding society; what you do is to modernize it” (Wiredu, 1980:1).  The theme of modernization occurs frequently in Wiredu’s corpus.  He does not fully conceptualize it nor relate it to the various ideological histories it has encountered in the domains of social science, where it became a fully fledged discipline. Modernization, for him, is based on an uncomplicated pragmatism that owes much to Deweyan thought.

This kind of posture, that is, the consistent critique of the retrogression inherent in tradition and its proclivity for the fossilization of culture, is directed at Leopold Sedar Senghor.  On Senghor, he writes, “it is almost as if he has been trying to exemplify in his own thought and discourse the lack of the analytical habit which he has attributed to the biology of the African.  Most seriously of all, Senghor has celebrated the fact our (traditional) mind is of a non-analytical bent; which is very unfortunate, seeing that this mental attribute is more of a limitation than anything else” (Wiredu, 1980:12).  Wiredu’s main criticism of Senghor is one that is always leveled against the latter.  Apart from that charge that Senghor essentializes the concept and ideologies of blackness, he is also charged with defeatism that undermines struggles for liberation and decolonization.  However, Paul Gilroy has unearthed a more sympathetic context in which to read and situate Senghorian thought.  In Gilroy’s reading, an acceptable ideology of blackness emerges from Senghor’s work. And in this way, Wiredu’s critique loses some of its originality.

Senghor is cast as a traditionalist and tradition itself is the subject of a much broader critique.  On some of the drawbacks of tradition Wiredu writes,

it is as true in Africa as anywhere else that logical, mathematical, analytical, experimental procedures are essential in the quest for the knowledge of, and control over, nature and therefore, in any endeavour to improve the condition of man. Our traditional culture was somewhat wanting in this respect and this is largely responsible for the weaknesses of traditional technology, warfare, architecture, medicine….” (Wiredu, 1980: 12) (italics mine)

Sometimes, Wiredu carries his critique of tradition too far as when he advances the view that “traditional medicine is terribly weak in diagnosis and weaker still in pharmacology” (Wiredu, 1980: 12).  In recent times, a major part of Hountondji’s project is to demonstrate that traditional knowledges are not only useful and viable but also the necessity to situate them in appropriate modern contexts.  Hountondji’s latest gesture is curious since both he and Wiredu are supposed to belong to the same philosophic tendency as described by Bodunrin under the rubric of West-led universalism.  However, Wiredu’s attack on tradition is vitiated by his project of conceptual decolonization which, in order to work, requires the recuperation of vital elements in traditional culture.

Wiredu’s stance in relation to modernization and tradition gets refined by his condemnation of some aspects of urban existence which exhibit a manifestation of postmodern environmentalism. First, he writes, “it is quite clear to me that unrestricted industrial urbanization is contrary to any humane culture; it is certainly contrary to our own” (Wiredu, 1980:22). Also, “one of the powerful strains on our extended family system is the very extensive poverty which oppresses out rural populations. Owing to this, people working in the towns and cities are constantly burdened with the financial needs of rural relatives which they usually cannot entirely satisfy”(Wiredu, 1980:22). Contemporary anthropological studies dealing with Africa have dwelt extensively on this phenomenon. The point is, in Africa, forms of sociality exists that can no longer be found in the North Atlantic civilization. If this civilization (the North Atlantic) is characterized by extreme individualism, African forms of social existence on the other hand tend towards the gregarious in which conceptions of generosity, corruption, gratitude, philanthropy, ethnicity  and even justice take on different slightly forms from what obtains within the vastly different North Atlantic context.

Also problematic is Wiredu’s reading of colonialism which is very similar to those of authors such as Ngugi wa Thiongo, Walter Rodney or even Chinua Achebe. In this reading, the colonized is abused, brutalized, silenced and reconstructed against her/his own will.  Colonialism causes the destruction of agency. On de-agentialization, Wiredu states, “any human arrangement is authoritarian if it entails any person being made to do or suffer something against his will, or if it leads to any person being hindered in the development of his own will” (Wiredu, 1980:2).  Homi Bhabha advances the notion of ambivalence to highlight the cultural reciprocities inherent in the entire colonial encounter and structure. This kind of reading of the colonial event has led to a rethinking of colonial theory. But Wiredu’s reading of the colonial encounter is infected by the radical persuasion of early African theorists of decolonization: “The period of colonial struggle was […] a period of cultural affirmation. It was necessary to restore in ourselves our previous confidence which had been so seriously eroded by colonialism. We are still, admittedly, even in post-colonial times, in an era of cultural self-affirmation” (Ibid.59).

5. An African Reading of Karl Marx

Marxist theory and discourse generally provided many African intellectuals with a platform on which to conduct many sociopolitical struggles. In fact, for many African scholars, it served as the only ideological tool. But not all scholars found Marxism acceptable. Wiredu was one of the scholars who has deep reservations about it. But he is not in doubt about the philosophical significance of Marx: “I regard Karl Marx as one of the great philosophers” (Wiredu, 1980:63). Derrida is even more forthcoming on the depth of this significance: “It will always be a fault not to read and reread and discuss Marx- which is to say also a few others- and to go beyond scholarly “reading” or “discussion.” It will be more and more a fault, a failing of theoretical, philosophical, political responsibility” (Derrida, 1994:13). Again, he writes, “the Marxist inheritance was- and still remains, and so it will remain- absolutely and thoroughly determinate. One need not be a Marxist or a communist in order to accept this obvious fact. We all live in a world, some would say a culture, that bears, at an incalculable depth, the mark of this inheritance, whether in a directly visible fashion or not”(Ibid.).

Marxism during era of the Cold War was the major ideological issue and in the present age of neoliberalism it continues to haunt (Derrida’s precise phrase is hauntology) us with its multiple legacies. Wiredu’s critique of Marx and Engels is located within the epoch of the Cold War. But from it, we get a glimpse of not only his political orientation but also his philosophical predilections. For instance, at a point, he claims “the food one eats, the hairstyle one adopts, the amount of money one has, the power one wields- all these and such circumstances are irrelevant from an epistemological point of view” (Wiredu, 1980:66). But Foucault-style analyses have demonstrated that these seemingly marginal activities have a tremendous impact on knowledge/power configurations that are often difficult to ignore. Michel de Certeau has demonstrated these so-called inconsequential acts become significant as gestures of resistance for the benefit of the weak and politically powerless. In his words, “the weak must continually turn to their own ends forces alien to them” (de Certeau 1984: xix). On those specific acts of the weak, he writes, “many everyday practices (talking, reading, moving about, shopping, cooking, etc.) are tactical in character. And so are, more generally, many “ways of operating”: victories of the “weak” over the “strong” (whether the strength be that of powerful people or the violence of things or of an imposed order, etc.), clever tricks, knowing how to get away with things, “hunter’s cunning,” maneuvers, polymorphic simulations, joyful discoveries, poetic  as well as warlike. The Greeks called these “ways of operating” metis (Ibid.). This reading gives an entirely different perspective on acts and themes of resistance as panoptical surveillance in the age of global neoliberalism becomes more totalitarian in nature at specific moments.

As a philosopher versed in analytic philosophy, truth is a primary concern of Wiredu and this concern is incorporated into his analysis of Marxist philosophy. Hence, he identifies the following points, “the cognition of truth is recognized by Engels as the business of philosophy; (2) What is denied is absolute truth, not truth as such; (3) The belief, so finely expressed, in the progressive character of truth; (4) Engels speaks of this process of cognition as the ‘development of science.’ (5) That a consciousness of limitation is a necessary element in all acquired knowledge” (Wiredu,1980:64-65). Wiredu explains that these various Marxian assertions on truth are no different from those of the logician, C. S. Peirce who had expounded them under a formulation he called “fallibilism.” John Dewey also expounded them under the concept of ‘pragmatism’(Ibid.67). So the point here is that some of the main Marxist propositions on truth have parallels in analytic philosophy. Nonetheless, this raises an unsettling question about Marxism and its relation to truth: “How is it that a philosophy which advocates such an admirable doctrine as the humanistic conception of truth tends so often to lead in practice to the suppression of freedom of thought and expression? Is it by accident that this comes to be so? Or is it due to causes internal to the philosophy of Marx and Engels”(Ibid.68). Wiredu demonstrates strong reservations about what Ernest Wamba dia Wamba calls ‘bureaucratic socialism.” Derrida on his part, urges us to distinguish between Marx as a philosopher and the innumerable specters of Marx. In other words, there is a difference between “the dogma machine and the “Marxist” ideological apparatuses (States, parties, cells, unions, and other places of doctrinal production)”(Derrida,1994:13)  and the necessity to treat Marx as a great philosopher. We need to “try to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of classified work” (Ibid.31).  We also need to remember that “he doesn’t belong to the communists, to the Marxists, to the parties, he ought to figure within our great canon of […] political philosophy” (Ibid.31).

Wiredu’s reading of Marxism generally is quite damaging. First, he states, “Engels himself, never perfectly consistent, already compromises his conception of truth with some concessions to absolute truth in Anti-Duhring” (Wiredu, 1980:68). He then makes an even more damaging accusation that a form of authoritarianism lies at the heart of conception of philosophy propagated by Marx and Engels.  On what he considers to a deep-seated confusion in their work, he writes, “Engels recognizes the cognition of truth to be a legitimate business of philosophy and makes a number of excellent points about truth. As soon, however, as one tries to find out what he and Marx conceived philosophy to be like, one is faced with a deep obscurity. The problem resolves round what one may describe as Marx’s conception of philosophy as ideology” (Ibid.70). Here, Wiredu makes the crucial distinction between Marx as a philosopher and the effects of his numerous spectralities and for this reason he offers his most important criticism of his general critique of Marxism. He also accuses Marx of instances of “carelessness in the use of cardinal terms” which he says “may be symptomatic of deep inadequacies of thought”(Ibid.74). This charge, which relates to Marx’s conception of consciousness is indeed serious since it borders on the question of conceptual clarification as advanced by the canon of analytic philosophy. Wiredu argues that Marx and Engels are unclear about their employment of the concept of ideology: “Marx and Engels are […] on the horns of a dilemma. If all philosophical thinking is ideological, then their thinking is ideological and, by their hypothesis, false”(Ibid.76). Wiredu’s insights are very important here: “He and Engels simply assumed for themselves the privilege of exempting their own philosophizing from the ideological theory of ideas”(Ibid.77). Consequently, Marx commits a grave error “in his conception of ideology and its bearing upon philosophy”(Ibid.81).

Another area Wiredu finds Marx and Engels wanting is moral philosophy. In other words, Marx “confused moral philosophy with moralism and assumed rather than argued a moral standpoint”(Ibid.79). Furthermore, he had precious little to say on the nature of the relationship between philosophy and morality. Engels does better on this score as there is a treatment of morality in Anti-Duhring. Nonetheless, Engels is charged with giving “no guidance on the conceptual problems that have perplexed moral philosophers” (Ibi.80). Henceforth, Wiredu becomes increasing dismissive of Marx, Marxism and its followers. First, he writes, “the run-of the-mill Marxists, even less enamoured of philosophical accuracy than their masters, have made the ideological conception of philosophy a battle cry”(Ibid.80). And then he singles out ‘scientific socialism’ which he regards as being unclear in its elaboration and which he typifies as “an amalgam of factual and evaluative elements blended together without regard to categorical stratification”(Ibid.85). In one of his most damaging assessments of Marxism, he declares: “Ideology is the death of philosophy. To the extent to which Marxism, by its own internal incoherences, tends to be transformed into an ideology, to that extent Marxism is a science of the unscientific and a philosophy of the unphilosophic” (Ibid.87).

In sum, Wiredu general attitude towards Marxism is one of condemnation. However, in the contemporary re-evaluations of Marxism a few discursive elements need to be clarified; the inclusion of the demarcation of Cold War and post Cold War assessments of Marxism ought to be employed as an analytical yardstick and also the necessity to sift through the various specters and legacies of Marx as distinct from those of Marxism. This is the kind of reading that Derrida urges us to do and it is also one to which we shall now turn our attention.

Derrida states it is imperative to distinguish between the legacies of Marx and the various spectralities of Marxism. In addition to this distinction we might add another crucial one: analyses of Marxism before and after the fall of the former Soviet Union. Wiredu’s critique is based on the pre-Soviet debacle whilst Derrida’s draws some of his reflections based on the post-Soviet fall. In these two different critiques, we must be careful to always strive to isolate the theoretical elements and insights that bypass short-lived discursive trends and political interests which often tend to vitiate the more profound effects of the works of Karl Marx and those that do not.

The debacle of the former Soviet Union and the apparent hegemony of neoliberal ideology have generated discourses associated with the “ends” of discourse. But Derrida points out that there is nothing new in the contemporary proclamations affirming the end of discourses which are in fact anachronistic when compared to the earlier versions of the same discursive orientation that emerged in the 1950s and which in a vital sense owed a great deal to a certain spirit of Marx: “the eschatological themes of the “end of history,” of the “end of Marxism,” of the “end of philosophy,” of the “ends of man,” of the “last man” and so forth were, in the ‘50s, that is, forty years ago our daily bread. We had this bread of apocalypse in our mouths naturally, already, just as naturally as that which I nicknamed after the fact, in 1980, the “apocalyptic tone in philosophy” (Derrida, 1994:14-15). In a way, in fact the contemporary discourses of endism that draw from the spirit of neoliberal triumphalism, without acknowledging it, are greatly indebted to Marxism and the more constructive critiques of it. Deconstruction, in part, emerged from the necessity to critique the various forms of statist Stalinism, the numerous socio-economic failings of Soviet bureaucracy and the political repression in Hungary. In other words, it emerged partly from the need to organize critiques for degraded forms of socialism.

In speaking about the inheritance of Marx, Derrida also reflects on the injunction associated with it. The task of reflecting on this inheritance and the injunction to which it gives rise is demanding: … “one must filter, sift, criticize, one must sort out several different possibles that inhabit the same injunction. And inhabit it in a contradictory fashion around a secret. If the readability of a legacy were given, natural, transparent, univocal, if it did not call for and at the same time defy interpretation, we would never have anything to inherit from it” (Ibid.16). Derrida’s employment of terms and phrases such “inheritance,” “injunction,” and the “spectrality of the specter” in relation to the legacies of Marx has to do with the question of the genius of Marx: “Whether evil or not, a genius operates, it always resists and defies after the fashion of a spectral thing. The animated work becomes that thing, the Thing that, like an elusive specter, engineers [s’ingenie] a habitation without proper inhabiting, call it is a haunting, of both memory and translation” (Ibid.18).

A work of genius, a masterpiece in addition to giving rise to spectralities also generates legions of imitators and followers. Of the Marxists who came after Marx, Wiredu writes; “I find that Marxists are especially prone to confuse factual with ideological issues. Undoubtedly, the great majority of those who call themselves Marxists do not share the ideology of Marx”(Wiredu,1980:94). In order to transcend the violence and confusion of Marxists who misread Marx, we need “to play Marx off against Marxism so as to neutralize, or at any rate muffle the political imperative in the untroubled exegesis of a classified work”(Derrida,1994:31). The work of re-reading Marx, of re-establishing his philosophical value and importance is a task needs to be performed in universities, conferences, colloquia and also in less academic sites and fora.

Within the contemporary cultural moment, new configurations have arisen that were not present during Marx’s day. Indeed, “a set of transformations of all sorts (in particular, techno-scientific-economic-media) exceeds both the traditional givens of the Marxist discourse and those of the liberal discourse opposed to it”(Ibid.70). Also,

Electoral representativity or parliamentary life is not only distorted, as was always the case, by a great number of socio-economic mechanisms, but it is exercised with more and more difficulty in a public space profoundly upset by techno-tele-media apparatuses and by new rhythms of information and communication, by the devices and the speed of forces represented by the latter, but also and consequently by the new modes of appropriation they put to work, by the new structure of the event and of its spectrality that they produce.” (Ibid.79)

Here, the instructive point is that the new information technologies have radically transformed the possibilities of the event and the modes of its production, reception and also interpretation. But there is a far more radical change that has occurred and which signals a profound crisis of global capitalism and the neoliberal ideology that underpins it: “For what must be cried out, at a time when some have the audacity to neo-evangelize in the name of the ideal of liberal democracy that has finally realized itself  as the ideal of human history: never have violence, inequality, exclusion, famine, and thus economic oppression affected as many human beings in the history of the earth and of humanity”(Ibid.85). Also, “never have so many men, women, and children been subjugated, starved, or exterminated on the earth.” (Ibid.)

So Derrida identifies a few new factors that need to be included in the critique of Marxism in the contemporary moment namely the phenomenon of spectralization caused by techno-science and digitalization, the weakening of the practice of liberal democracy and also the crises and multiple contradictions inherent in global capitalism. It is necessary to include another element into the present configuration which is the rise of political Islam as an alternative ideology, its subsequent fervent politicization and its Western reconstruction into an ideology of terror.

Wiredu’s reading of Marx focuses on the conceptual infelicities in the latter’s theorizations of notions such as “ideology,” “consciousness,” and “truth.” Wiredu also criticizes Marx’s project of moral philosophy or in fact the lack of it. On the whole, his reading isn’t complementary. Indeed, it amounts to a dismissal of Marx in spite of the attempt to read him without the obfuscations of innumerable legacies.

6. Conclusion

Arguably, Wiredu’s particular contribution to the debate on the origins, status, problematic and future of contemporary African philosophy resides in his formulations regarding his theory of conceptual decolonization. His approach in formulating this theory of discursive agency and more specifically philosophical practice involves the incorporation of a form bi-culturalism. In other words, his approach entails analyses of the canon of Western philosophy and also the manifestations of tribal cultures as a way of attaining a conceptual synthesis. Indeed, this schema involves a forceful element of bi-culturalism as a matter of logical consequence as well as a high level of [multi] bi-lingual competence. As such, it not only an exercise in conceptual synthesis but it is also a project involving comparative linguistics.

In Anglophone parts of Africa, Wiredu’s experience and research in teaching African philosophy has had a tremendous significance. The positive aspect of this is that the study of African philosophical thought has in positive moments transcended the problematic of identity or what has been termed as the problematic of origins. The less complimentary dimension of this equation is that Wiredu’s discoveries have given rise to (most undoubtedly unwittingly) a somewhat hegemonic school of disciples that is fostering a delimiting academicism and which is contrary to his essential spirit of conceptual inventiveness. As such, it might become necessary not only to critique Wiredu’s corpus but perhaps also Wiredu’s school of disciples which rather than appreciate the originality of his formulations fall instead for the pitfalls of over-ideologization.

Undoubtedly, Wiredu discovered a challenging path in modern African thought in which he sometimes takes the meaning of the existence of African philosophy for granted. In addition, it has been observed that also lacking at some moments in his oeuvre is an attempt to de-totalize and hence particularize the components of what he regards of the foundations of African philosophy.  In other words, African philosophy finds its form, shape and also its conceptual moorings above the discursive platform provided by Western philosophy. In addition, the theoretical space made available for its articulation is derived from the same Western-donated pool of unanimism. Part of recent interrogations of Wiredu’s work includes a questioning of the legitimacy of that space as the only site on which to construct an entire philosophical practice for the alienated, hybrid African consciousness. Oftentimes the question is posed, what are the ways by which the space can be broadened?

Indeed, terms such as reflective integration and due reflection offer the critical spaces for the theoretical articulation of something whose existence has not yet been concretely conceived. So in Wiredu’s corpus we see the very familiar problematic involving the tradition/modernity dichotomy being played out. Finally, it can be argued that this tension is not quite resolved but fortunately it is also a tension that never jeopardizes his philosophical inventiveness. Rather, it seems to animate his reflections in unprecedented ways.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Cronon, D. E. 1955. Black Moses: The Story of Marcus Garvey and the Universal Negro Improvement Association, Wisconsin: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cummings, Robert. 1986. “Africa between the Ages” in African Studies Review, Vol. 29, No. 3, September.
  • Diop, Cheikh, Anta, 1974. The African Origin of Civilization: Myth or Reality? Trans. M. Cook, Westport, Conn.: Lawrence Hill.
  • Doortmont, Michel R. 2005 The Pen-Pictures of Modern Africans and African Celebrities by Charles Francis Hutchison,  Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dubow, Saul. 2000 The African National Congress, Johannesburg: Jonathan Ball.
  • Derrida, Jacques. 1994. Specters of Marx: the state of the debt, the work of mourning, & the new international, trans. Peggy Kamuf, New York: Routledge.
  • Gates Jr., H. L. 1992. Loose Canons, New York: OxfordUniversity Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1967 Black Skin, White Masks (trans. C. Van Markmann) New York: Grove Press.
  • Fanon, Frantz. 1963 The Wretched of the Earth, London: Penguin.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1974 The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1977 Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison. Trans A. M. Sheridan-Smith. London: Allen Lane.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1980 Language, Counter-Memory and Practice. Selected Essays and Interviews. Ed. Donald Bouchard, Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1982 The Archaeology of Knowledge. New York: Pantheon.
  • Foucault, Michel. 1991 “Governmentality” in G. Burchell, C. Gordon and P. Miller, eds, The Foucault Effect.Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Hountondji, Paulin. 1983 African Philosophy: Myth and Reality, London: Hutchinson and Co.
  • Hountondji, Paulin.  2002 The Struggle for Meaning: Reflections on Philosophy, Culture and Democracy in Africa, Athens: Ohio University Center for International Studies.
  • Masolo, D.A. 1994 African Philosophy in Search of Identity Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1988 The Invention of Africa Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Mudimbe V.Y. 1994. The Idea of Africa,Bloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Oladipo,  Olusegun. ed. 2002  The Third Way in African Philosophy:Essays in Honour of Kwasi WireduIbadan: Hope Publications Ltd.
  • Osha, Sanya, 2005 Kwasi Wiredu and Beyond: The Text, Writing and Thought in Africa, Dakar: Codesria.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1976 Myth, Literature and the African World Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole,   1988 Art, Dialogue and Outrage Ibadan: New Horn Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole, 1996 The Open Sore of a Continent New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole.  1999 The Burden of Memory, The Muse of Forgiveness New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Soyinka, Wole. 2000 “Memory, Truth and Healing” in The Politics of Memory, Truth, Healing and Social Justice, eds. I. Amaduime and A. An-Na’im, London: Zed Books
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1972 HomecomingLondon, Ibadan, Lusaka: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1981 Writers in PoliticsNairobi: Heinemann.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1986 Decolonising the MindNairobi: E.A.E.P.
  • Wa Thiongo, Ngugi. 1993 Moving the CentreLondon: James Currey.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. Philosophy and an African CultureCambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1980.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1983 “The Akan Concept of Mind” in Ibadan Journal of Humanistic Studies, No. 3.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1985 “The Concept of Truth in Akan Language” in P.O. Bodunrin ed. Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Ile-Ife: University of Ife Press.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. and Gyekye, Kwame. 1992 Persons and Community. Washington, D.C.: The Council for Research in Values and Philosophy.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1993 “Canons of Conceptualisation” in The Monist: An International Journal of General Philosophical Inquiry Vol. 76, No. 4 October.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi. 1995 Conceptual Decolonization in African PhilosophyIbadan: Hope Publications.
  • Wiredu, Kwasi.  1996 Cultural Universals and ParticularsBloomington and Indianapolis: IndianaUniversity Press.
  • Yai, Olabiyi. 1977 “The Theory and Practice in African Philosophy: The Poverty of Speculative Philosophy,” Second Order: An African Journal of Philosophy, Vol.VI, No.2.

 

Author Information

Sanya Osha
Email: babaosha@yahoo.com
Tshwane University of Technology
South Africa

Xenophon (430—354 B.C.E.)

XenophonXenophon was a Greek philosopher, soldier, historian, memoirist, and the author of numerous practical treatises on subjects ranging from horsemanship to taxation.  While best known in the contemporary philosophical world as the author of a series of sketches of Socrates in conversation, known by their Latin title Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology which present a set of vivid and intriguing portraits of Socrates and display some sharp contrasts to the better known portraits in the works of Xenophon’s contemporary, Plato.  Xenophon’s influence in Antiquity, the Middle Ages, and in Early Modern intellectual circles was considerable; he was a pioneer in several literary genres including the first-person military memoir (Anabasis) , the biographical novel (Education of Cyrus), and the continued history (Hellenica).  The range of his areas of expertise and the glancing charm of his down-to-earth writing style continue to fascinate and repay our study. For one example of his work in moral philosophy, he emphasized the importance of self-control, which comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality. This is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways.  Socrates is often said by Xenophon to have exemplified it in the very highest degree.  Cyrus displays it when he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; but his general Araspas stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor, and ignites a chain of events described by Xenophon that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Times
  2. Xenophon’s Socrates
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Moral Philosophy
  5. Practical Treatises
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Times

Xenophon was born during the early years of the Peloponnesian War, in the outlying deme of Athens called Erchia.  Located in the fertile plain known as “Mesogeia” (literally “middle earth”) and overlooked by the beautiful mountains Hymettus and Penteli, Erchia was about 20 kilometers (12 miles) from the bustling center of Athens–about a three hour walk or one hour brisk horseback ride.  His father Gryllus owned and supervised an estate whose income derived chiefly from farming.  Thus, Xenophon will have grown up surrounded by a combination of small hold-farming and urban influences.   Coming of an age in turbulent political times, Xenophon is thought to have been in Athens and personally present at the return of Alcibiades (408), the trial of the Generals, and the overthrow of the 30 Tyrants, all signal events in the rough history of Athenian civic life.

Little else is known about Xenophon’s earliest years.  From his later writings it can be safely inferred that he received a good basic education and military training as befitted a young member of the Equestrian class, that he was able to ride and hunt extensively, and that in his formative years he observed the careful work needed to keep a modest farm maintained and productive.

In 401. B.C.E at the age of 29, Xenophon was invited by his friend Proxenus to join him on a mercenary military venture to Persia, ostensibly to protect the territory of a minor satrap who was under threat.  In fact, though this was not known to Xenophon or Proxenus, the campaign was rather more ambitious than that: it was a game of thrones, nothing less than an assault on the claim of the Persian king Artaxerxes II, by his brother Cyrus the Younger.  The unfolding of this journey into foreign territory, with its adventures and mortal hazards, was a formative event in Xenophon’s life.  In the very first engagement, Cyrus was himself killed.  In a peace parley that followed, the generals of the expeditionary force were executed by treachery, leaving the army stranded, leaderless and surrounded by hostile peoples whose languages they did not speak, and winter was coming.  Xenophon eventually assumed leadership of this stranded and confused army, and led them to safety – as many as survived.  The book which Xenophon later wrote about their harrowing travels ‘up country’, Anabasis, is a hair-raising and brutally graphic soldier’s journal, of which more will be said later.

Upon his return to Greece, Xenophon continued his mercenary work under a Spartan general named Agesilaus.  He even went fighting, with Agesilaus’ “10,000” soldiers who returned from the battle of Coroneia in Persia, against a combined Athenian and Theban force.  Athens issued a decree of exile against Xenophon as a result. .  Even though it is possible that his banishment was revoked in later years, Xenophon never returned to Athens.

In gratitude for his service in this decisive Lacedaimonian victory, the Spartans gave Xenophon an estate in Elis, about 2 miles from Olympia – a region of the Peloponnese which was known for its unparalleled beauty and richness.  Here in Elis over the next 23 years, Xenophon would live a life of semi-retirement and quiet rural pursuits.  Here also he would write the bulk of his works, raise a family, and keep a distanced and reflective historical eye on the political fortunes of Athens. Nothing is known of his wife beyond her name: Philesia.  He had two sons, Gryllus and Diodorus. The Former was killed in the battle of Mantinea in 362 B.C., and Xenophon received many carefully written eulogies, a testament to his prominence in his own time.

When his adoptive city of Sparta was defeated in the Battle of Leuctra in 371 B.C., Elians drove Xenophon from his rural retreat and confiscated it.  Xenophon then moved to “flowery Corinth” where he ended his days.

2. Xenophon’s Socrates

Xenophon’s portrait of Socrates in four loosely topic-organized books is known as Memorabilia.  Any reader who comes across of this work after even a minimal exposure to the better-known Socrates of Plato’s dialogues is in for a shock.  One rare reader who encountered Xenophon’s Socrates first was John Stuart Mill, who refers to it in the context of a description of Mill’s own father:

My father's moral convictions, wholly dissevered from religion, were very much of the character of those of the Greek philosophers; and were delivered with the force and decision which characterized all that came from him. Even at the very early age at which I read with him the Memorabilia of Xenophon, I imbibed from that work and from his comments a deep respect for the character of Socrates; who stood in my mind as a model of ideal excellence: and I well remember how my father at that time impressed upon me the lesson of the "Choice of Hercules."  At a somewhat later period the lofty moral standard exhibited in the writings of Plato operated upon me with great force. (Autobiography, ch.2.)

Xenophon’s Socrates is shown in conversation with various people from a wide variety of walks of life and with quite starkly different moral characters; one of his conversation partners is a famous prostitute, another is an aspiring young politician who knows little about life, another is a son of Pericles, and yet another is a grump; the colorful list goes on.  The individual books of the “Memorabilia” each contain many different conversational vignettes and set pieces, yet they consistently show a Socrates who is above all committed to helping people improve their lives in all practical dimensions; “Socrates was so useful in all circumstances and in all ways…” Memorabilia IV.i.1).  In contrast to Plato’s Socrates, who is committed to “follow the argument wherever, like a wind, it may lead us” (Plato, Republic 394D), Xenophon’s Socrates strives always to send his conversation partners away with some nuggets of practical advice which they may put to use right away.

A brief and selective thematic summary of each book follows:

Memorabilia I:   The book begins with a defense of Socrates against the legal charges which led to his execution, in a long initial section narrated by the author in his own voice.  Socrates enjoined piety and respect for divination, which should be consulted before every momentous life-choice.  He avoided speculation about the nature of the cosmos; “…(h)is own conversation was ever of human things.  The problems he discussed were: what is godly? What is ungodly; what is just, what is unjust; what is prudence; what is madness; what is courage, what is cowardice; what is a state, what is a statesman; what is government, and what is a governor; - these, and others like them…” (Memorabilia.I.1.16).   In a conversation with Aristodemus, Socrates presents an extended ‘argument from design’ to strengthen religious faith; the concept of God here manifested is strikingly monotheistic and is also woven throughout the natural world (Memorabilia I.iv.3-19). To the charge of corrupting the youth, Xenophon writes, “…in control of his own passions and appetites he was the strictest of men” (Memorabilia II.ii.1). (The theme of self-control, both in the sense of restraint of the appetites and in that of autonomy, is strong throughout the Memorabilia.) Socrates “led men up” to self-control, motivated by his love of humanity (Memorabilia I.v, I.2.60).

Memorabilia II:  The theme of self-control is here pursued, and the famous set-piece called “Choice of Herakles” is presented (Memorabilia II.i.21-33), in a version ascribed to Prodicus.  Here, while meditating in a quiet place, the young Herakles is approached by two women who represent the lives of Virtue and Vice respectively.  Each lady tries to persuade Herakles to choose her way, with Vice offering a life of pleasures and self-indulgence, and Virtue offering the rigors of self-control which she argues will lead to true happiness.  (Oddly, the anecdote ends before Herakles chooses.)  There then follows a series of forays into the topic of human relationships as components of the good life; parents give selflessly to their children (a poignant passage describes the tireless work of mothers in particular – Memorabilia II.ii.5); friends are “more useful than any possession”, and are humorously described as being ‘hunted’ and ‘seduced by Siren song’ into one’s life, but the bottom line is that friendship is a good thing based on goodness (Memorabilia II.ii.x).  The value of work as a component of the good life is underscored by a lengthy discussion between Socrates and Aristarchus (Memorabilia II.vii), who has 14 female relatives living under his roof.  Socrates advises him to start a home textile business putting these ladies to work.  They’ll be happier, and work makes for virtue.  This scheme is represented as successful.  (The importance of toil, work, even rough manual labor, to virtue is a continuing theme for Xenophon, and a topic on which his views run counter to the aristocratic mentality of his time.)

Memorabilia III: Here Socrates offers practical advice to several different individuals concerning military leadership and what it takes to become a successful general.  The end goal, he maintains, is to make the soldiers better human beings.  Thus the type of knowledge and expertise required is rather generally found in many different pursuits; even in business (for which one conversation partner has expressed contempt), the goal is the betterment of all individuals concerned; “Don’t look down on business”, Socrates warns (Memorabilia III.iv).  (The idea that there are very general skills which lead to success in a huge variety of human endeavors is a strong theme in Xenophon’s works elsewhere as well.)   General knowledge about human nature and how to be a good leader should combine with the requisite practical knowledge about one’s chosen field, and in all fields moderation and self-control are crucially valuable traits.  Eupraxia, being a good and good-oriented practitioner, is valuable in every field, whether one is a farmer, physician, or politician (Memorabilia III.ix).  In a long set-piece, Socrates is shown visiting a beautiful and famous prostitute named Theodote, and conversing with her about friendship and how to treat one’s friends.  This highly interesting passage, unique in ancient philosophy in presenting a conversation between a working woman (of dubious social standing even!) and a well-known male philosopher, is full of humor and double-entendre but ends with Socrates inviting Theodote to come philosophize with him and his ‘girlfriends’ any time (Memorabilia III.xi).  Finally, Socrates is here something of a fitness guru, advising Epigenes to get out and get some exercise;  “…(t)here is no kind of struggle, apart from war, and no undertaking in which you will be worse off by keeping your body in better fettle” (Memorabilia III.xii.5). (An emphasis on physical fitness achieved through vigorous exercise is a very significant theme throughout Xenophon’s works.)

Memorabilia IV:  The importance of self-control to success in every field of endeavor is again underscored and argued for; talented youths and high-bred horses alike need careful training and structure in order to avoid running off the rails with maturity.  The moral quality of sophrosyne, moderation, prudence, and good habits combined, is said to be most needful in our behavior toward the gods.  For the gods are such benefactors to us that it is asked: How is it possible to be grateful enough?   Socrates offers a translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”, as follows:  a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).  Socrates is described as having the mission of making his companions more law-abiding, more efficacious in their chosen work, more prudent or moderate, and more self-controlled.  Self-control is integral to that precious quality freedom, because no one is free who is ruled by bodily pleasure (Memorabilia IV.v).  This book ends with a beautiful encomium to Socrates spoken in what seems to be Xenophon’s own most authentic voice (Memorabilia IV.viii.11):

All who knew what manner of man Socrates was and who seek after virtue continue to this day to miss him beyond all others, as the chief of helpers in the quest for virtue.  For myself, I have described him as he was: so religious that he did nothing without counsel from the gods; so just that he did no injury, however small, to any man, but conferred the greatest benefits on all who dealt with him…To me then he seemed to be all that a truly good and happy man must be.

In addition to the Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology.

Xenophon’s Symposium depicts an avowedly lighthearted group of friends attending a spontaneous dinner-party in honor of young Autolycus’ victory in an Olympic event.  Entertainment is provided by young talent dancing, singing, and performing feats of agility, while the conversation turns on each guest explaining what he values most about himself: beauty, wealth, poverty, friends, and traits of character are all offered and discussed.  Socrates presents his central attribute as the ability to be a “procurer” (essentially, a pimp); he explains that he is able to improve people and make them better, more useful, more valuable to the city, and is in this analogous to a successful pimp who is able to bring out the best in his stable of prostitutes.  In a more serious vein, Socrates explains the superior value of spiritual love over physical love, and the centrality of virtue to genuine love.  “(T)he greatest blessing that befalls the man who yearns to render his favorite a good friend is the necessity of himself making virtue his habitual practice” (Symposium viii.27).  Weirdly, the evening ends with a demonstration of smooching between two of the young musicians which is so hot that everyone rushes off home to his wife (if he has one) or professes the intention to acquire a wife as soon as possible, if he is still single.

Xenophon’s Apology begins with Socrates explaining to his friend Hermogenes why he has not been working on his defense speech: he has been hindered by his divine sign, and moreover is quite ready to die.  Socrates justifies his readiness by noting the evils of old age that he will avoid, and the blamelessness of his life.  When at trial, he defends himself from the charge of impiety by noting his regular participation in all sacrifices and other public religious rituals.  Against the charge of corrupting the youth, he notes that through the oracle at Delphi, “…Apollo answered that no man was more free than I, or more just, or more prudent” (Apology 14).  After his condemnation to death, Socrates comforts his tearful friends with a Stoic-sounding thought:  “Have you not known all along that from the moment of my birth nature had condemned me to death?” (Apology 27). Xenophon concludes in his own voice (Apology 34):

And so, in contemplating the man’s wisdom and nobility of character, I find it beyond my power to forget him or, in remembering him, to refrain from praising him.  And if among those who make virtue their aim any one has ever been brought into contact with a person more helpful than Socrates, I count that man worthy to be called most blessed.

3. Political Philosophy

Xenophon’s political philosophy is a matter of interpretation and some controversy.  Did his relationship with Sparta incline him away from Athenian democratic values?  Was his evident admiration for Persian kings indicative of an allegiance to absolute monarchy?   The main works examined in an effort to reconstruct this aspect of his thought are The Education of Cyrus (also known as Cyropaedia;) a partial biography of a Persian king building an empire, the Anabasis (account of the ill-fated Greek mercenary expedition in Persia), Hiero (a conversation about tyranny), Agesilaus (biography of a Spartan general),the Constitution of the Lacedaimonians (description of the system of laws and social practices of Sparta), and Hellenica (history of Greece from 411 – 362 B.C.E., taking up where Thucydides ends). One thing is clear and beyond controversy: Xenophon has an abiding interest in describing leadership, the constellation of qualities that enables a person to function as a leader in groups, whether military, civic, or familial.

That Xenophon admires the Spartan system and the individuals it produces is evident from both the portrait of Agesilaus and the description of the Spartan political system developed by the legendary  Lycurgus (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians).  Agesilaus is a ferocious military tactician and fighter who waged campaigns in Persia and on Greek soil.  Xenophon gives minute descriptions of the strategies Ageilaus used against the deceptive Persian general Tissaphernes, the successes of which resulted in the latter losing his head (literally).  It is thought that Xenophon was among the soldiers serving under Agesilaus at the battle of Coronea, judging from the immediacy of descriptions like this word picture of the aftermath of this particularly gruesome clash (Agesilaus II.14):

Now that the fighting was at an end, a weird spectacle met the eye, as one surveyed the scene of the conflict – the earth stained with blood, friend and foe lying dead side by side, shields smashed to pieces, spears snapped in two, daggers bared of their sheaths, some on the ground, some embedded in the bodies, some yet gripped by the hand.

What Xenophon admires most about Agesilaus though is the way his character shines through in his leadership (Agesliaus  II. 8).

(H)e took care to render his men capable of meeting all calls on their endurance; he filled their hearts with confidence that they were able to withstand any and every enemy; he inspired them all with an eager determination to out-do one another in valour; and lastly he filled all with anticipation that many good things would befall them, if only they proved good men.  For he believed that men so prepared fight with all their might; nor in point of fact did he deceive himself.

Here is that general who eats with the common soldiers, fights as hard as they do or harder, sleeps on the rudest bed in the battalion, and is tireless in care for their welfare.  Here too, we find Xenophon noting the Spartan’ general’s “love of toil” (he is philoponos, AgesilausIX.3), and the fact that he had fortified his soul “against all the assaults of lucre, of pleasure, and of fear” (Agesilaus VIII.8). Thanks to all of this and more, the Spartan remained a formidable and gnarly opponent into his eighties, and left behind him the best type of monument: the admiration of all who had known him or known of him.

The Constitution of the Lacedaimonians draws a mostly admiring portrait of the creation of distinctively Spartan social customs and military might, by a (probably mythical) genius social engineer named Lycurgus.  Like the inscription over the ant-colony entrance in T. H. White’s The Sword in the Stone, (White 1938, ch.13) “EVERYTHING NOT FORBIDDEN IS COMPULSORY,” Spartan society is legislated down to the most personal details (where men are allowed to eat supper, how much female children get fed, whether an unused horse can be borrowed, etc.) to produce an efficient warrior-making machine in which accumulations of wealth and private property were rendered impossible and the famous “equality’ which made Sparta so stable (in Xenophon’s apparent view at any rate) was forged.   Spartan soldiers were required by law to practice gymnastics while out on campaign, “…and the result is that they take more pride in themselves and have a more dignified appearance than other men” (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians  XII.5).  Extreme measures are taken with young boys, to ensure that they will develop the proper level of discipline and collectivist thinking that will produce obedient and happily equal adult citizens: they are taken from their homes at age 7 and from thenceforth live in military-like barracks, subject to discipline by any adult male who might see them transgress in any way.

Should we infer that Xenophon endorses this radical social engineering program and its collectivist political philosophy, or only that he finds it a fascinating and impressive experiment which did in fact make Sparta the most feared military force in the Greek world of its time?   Whichever interpretation we choose, it is clear at the end of the treatise that the experiment was not a lasting and unambiguous success; Xenophon writes that Spartan citizens have in fact gone over to the accumulation of individual wealth, have grown fond of wielding power over remote cities, and have lost that unanimity which was Lycurgus’ energetically-sought goal.

Did Xenophon provide an answer to the question about an Ideal Polis, a most desirable form of political organization?  Some scholars have argued that we can look for glimmerings of this in the Anabasis, where the Greek army in its struggle to reach the sea can be viewed as a “polis on the move” (Waterfield 2006, p.147).  As the shattered mercenary troops struggle to stay organized and to survive their pitiless march through the foodless deserts of Assyria and the freezing mountains of Armenia, various forms of political organization surface at various times.  While an army is most naturally understood as an oligarchy, with orders coming from a few and being followed by the many, there are also moments of democracy: soldiers hold general assemblies and agree upon resolutions which they will represent to their commanding officers.  Xenophon himself is elected by popular acclaim early in the march.  As leader, he keeps his eye on the welfare of the troops: defusing anarchy, strategically seeking out food and safety, and making the tough decisions necessary for the good of all, such as abandoning the camp followers and horses in deep mountain snow when it became clear they were a mortal liability.  During its course, Xenophon emphasizes the importance of piety and ritual which bind a polis together in homonoia or like-mindedness.  At the climactic moment when the lead troops crest a rise and spot the sea, immediately after dancing for joy and famously shouting, “Thalatta!  Thalatta!” (the sea, the sea), they build a cairn of stones to honor the gods.

The political philosophies which can be discerned in Xenophon’s largest and perhaps strangest work, The Education of Cyrus, are a matter of great controversy.  Some paradoxical aspects of the work fuel the arguments about how it should be interpreted.  Cyrus is undoubtedly a terrific leader and a daunting empire-builder, but he is seen to have some off-putting traits such as arrogance, a tendency to fear his own sensuality, and questionable judgment from time to time.  Does this mean Xenophon is implicitly criticizing the Persian model of monarchy?  Yet he takes pains, in this massive book, to show Cyrus’ uncanny ability to mobilize support and suppress resistance, and his dedication to both recognizing and rewarding nobility and virtue.  Cyrus is repeatedly seen to emphasize that the best army consists of soldiers serving of their own free will, being rewarded for their merits, and feeling respect and gratitude to their leaders.

They came not from compulsion but from their own free will, and out of gratitude.  (Cyropaedia  IV.iii.11)

Perhaps we should conclude that Xenophon’s political theory is flexible, and that the most key element of any polis revolves around the leadership skills of those in charge, alongside their self-control and devotion to the good of the whole.

4. Moral Philosophy

As seen above in the discussion of Xenophon’s Socrates and of the ideal leader, certain themes recur in Xenophon’s moral reflections. Some of the most frequently recurring ideas are:

  1.  The importance of self-control: Sophrosyne, self-control, moderation, restraint of appetite, and balance, comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality, and it is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways.  Socrates is often said to have exemplified it in the highest degree.  Cyrus displays it when (Cyropaedia V.i-VII.iii) he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; his general Araspas by contrast stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor and ignites a chain of events that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.
  2. A demanding work-ethic:  Hard work makes for virtue in several ways.  It conduces to health, it results in earned rewards, it keeps us off the streets of temptation, and builds character.   In the Oeconomicus, a treatise on household management, Xenophon tells the story of a visit paid by a Greek ambassador to Cyrus the Persian king in his royal gardens.  Cyrus astounds the Greek by stating that he himself laid out the garden plan and works in it regularly. Cyrus continues (Oeconomicus IV.24),
  3. "I never yet sat down to dinner when in sound health, without first working hard at some task of war or agriculture, or exerting myself somehow."
  4. The Greek replies, “I think you deserve your happiness, Cyrus, for you earn it by your virtue”.
  5. An ideal of service: It is impossible to miss this emphasis in Xenophon’s remembrances of Socrates, “…so useful in all circumstances and in all ways” (Memorabilia IV.i.1).  Socrates can frequently be seen offering practical help, life advice, and moral guidance to friends and total strangers.  Indeed Xenophon’s Socrates resembles an uncompensated life-coach in marked ways.  Do you have lots of ‘friends’ but suspect they just want something from you? Be more discerning and take better care of your real friends; then friendships will be on a more solid footing (advice to a prostitute; MemorabiliaII.xi).  Do you over-react to other peoples’ rudeness?  Adjust your attitude; it’s not always about you (MemorabiliaIII.xiii).  Feuding with your brother?  Study the natural world and observe that animals reared together feel a yearning for each other’s company; love between brothers is more natural than discord (Memorabilia II.iii.4).
  6. A certain utilitarianism: The best actions are the most practically beneficial for all.  In Xenophon there is nothing of the soul’s solitary winged journey toward fulfillment in transcendence.  Goodness is good for the here and now, and good for the city, or the army, or the whole farm.  Eupraxia, doing well and doing things beneficially, is of the highest value.
  7. A certain egalitarianism: Although Xenophon was no feminist, he does present the idea that the wife who is a full partner in household management contributes as much to the welfare of the estate as does her husband (Oeconomicus III.15).  Wives and husbands should be co-workers in the household (Oeconomicus III.x).  And he gives to Socrates these memorable lines about how hard it is to be a mother of small children, a passage unique in classical literature (Memorabilia II.ii.5):

The woman conceives and bears her burden in travail, risking her life, and giving of her own food; and, with much labor, having endured to the end and brought forth her child, she rears and cares for it, although she has not received any good thing, and the babe neither recognizes its benefactress nor can make its wants known to her; still she guesses what is good for it, and what it likes, and seeks to supply these things, and rears it for a long season, enduring toil day and night, nothing knowing what return she will get.

He writes admiringly of the general who eats with his men and eats the same food, of the king who works in his garden, of Socrates chatting with a prostitute, of the virtue of Panthea and her noble death (Cyropaedia VII.iii.14).  He admires the Spartan ideal of equality and laments its erosion.

5. Practical Treatises

  Xenophon’s collected works include several shorter dialogues and essays in which he (like his Socrates) provides useful and practically applicable advice on topics like choosing and training a war-horse (On Horsemanship), being a cavalry commander (The Cavalry Commander),  hunting (On Hunting), taxation (Ways and Means), and home economics (Oeconomicus).  These treatises are not flatly how-to manuals but also are infused with a distinctive world-view and a definite value-scheme.

So for example, in the treatise on horsemanship, Xenophon presents a definite equine psychology and a training ethic; the training should not be harsh, because “…nothing forced can ever be beautiful”.  The horse

must follow the indication of the aids to display of his own free will all the most beautiful and brilliant qualities (On Horsemanship XI.6).

Xenophon stresses commonalities between horses and humans.   Old saws apply equally to horses and to humans, as in the following text concerning the length of galloping sets: “In excess of the proper limit, nothing whatsoever is enjoyable, either to a horse or a man” (X.14).  It is noticeable that Xenophon does not simply say that running a horse ragged is counterproductive in training.  His point differs from this claim in two ways: he stresses again the commonality between horse and human; and he places the emphasis of the training advice upon what is pleasing (‘edu) to the horse.  Thus the horse is conceived as a partner, rather than an object, in the training project, and a partner whose willing and appreciative participation in the project is essential to its success.

So also, in the Oeconomicus, there is not simply practical instruction about running a successful small farm, but a general theme of praise for engagement, orderliness, and system that has sometimes a definite political ring, as in the following passage (Oeconomicus V.i):

For the pursuit of (farming) is in some sense a luxury as well as a means of increasing one’s estate and of training the body in all that a free man should be able to do.

Sometimes however it just sounds quaint; “What a beautiful sight is afforded by boots of all sorts arranged in rows!” (Oeconomicus VIII.19).

Thus, Xenophon’s philosophical projects were infused with a commitment to practical usefulness just as his practical treatises convey a philosophy that is still of interest today, with its emphasis on engagement in the world, on knowing who we are and how we can help.   Recall Socrates’ translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”; a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, J.K., 2001, Xenophon, Bristol, U.K.: Bristol Classical.
  • Brickhouse, T., 2002, The trial and execution of Socrates: sources and controversies, New York : Oxford University Press.
  • Bruell, C., “Xenophon”, in History of Political Philosophy, ed. L. Strauss and J. Cropsey, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987, 89-117.
  • Buzzetti, E., 2001, “The Rhetoric of Xenophon and the Treatment of Justice in the Memorabilia”, in Interpretation 29.1: 3-35.
  • Cooper, J., 1999, "Notes on Xenophon's Socrates”, in Cooper, J., Reason and Emotion: Essays on Ancient Moral Psychology and Ethical Theory, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press: 3-28.
  • Danzig, G. 2005, “Intra-Socratic Polemics: The Symposia of Plato and Xenophon”, in Greek, Roman, and Byzantine Studies 45: 331-357.
  • Dillery, John, 1995, Xenophon and the History of his Times, New York: Routledge.
  • Dorion, Louis-Andre, 2010, “The Straussian Exegesis of Xenophon: The Paradigmatic Case of Memorabilia IV 4”, in V. Gray. (ed.) Xenophon: Oxford Readings in Classical Studies, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 283-323.
  • Fox, R.L. (ed.), 2004, The Long March: Xenophon and the Ten Thousand, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Gray, V., 1998, The Framing of Socrates: The Literary Interpretation of Xenophon’s Memorabilia, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Gray, V. (ed.), 2010, Xenophon: Oxford Readings in Classical Studies, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Higgins, W. 1977, Xenophon the Athenian: the problem of the individual and the society of the polis, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Howland, J., 2000, “Xenophon’s Philosophical Odyssey: On the Anabasis and Plato’s Republic”, in American Political Science Review, 94.4: 875-889.
  • Johnson, D. , 2003, “Xenophon’s Socrates on Justice and the Law”, in Ancient Philosophy, 23: 255-281.
  • Judson, L. and Karasmanis, V. (edd.), 2006, Remembering Socrates, Oxford: Clarendon Press; New York : Oxford University Press
  • Nadon, C., 2001, Xenophon’s Prince: Republic and Empire in the Cyropaedia, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • O’Connor, David K., 1994, “The Erotic Self-Sufficiency of Socrates: A Reading of Xenophon’s Memorabilia”, in The Socratic Movement ed. P. A. Vander Waerdt; Ithaca NY: Cornell University Press, 150-180.
  • Pangle, T.L., 1994, “Socrates in the Context of Xenophon’s Political Writings”, in P. A. Van Der Waerdt (ed.) , The Socratic Movement, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 2004: 127-150.
  • Pomeroy, S. 1994, Xenophon: Oeconomicus, A Social and Historical Commentary, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Sandridge, Norman B., 2012, Loving Humanity, Learning, and Being Honored: The Foundations of Leadership in Xenophon’s Education of Cyrus, Washington D.C.: Center for Hellenic Studies.
  • Sandridge, Norman B., 2012: webmaster for an online commentary on Cyropaedia (an international and ongoing collaborative scholarly project) at www.cyropaedia.org
  • Seager, R., 2001, “Xenophon and Athenian Democratic Ideology”, in Classical Quarterly, 51.2: 385-397.
  • Strauss, L., 1948, On Tyranny, Glencoe, IL: The Free Press.
  • Tatum, J., 1989, Xenophon’s Imperial Fiction, Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Tuplin, C. (ed.), 2004, Xenophon and his World, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Van Der Waerdt, P. A. ed.1994, The Socratic Movement, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Vlastos, G, 1991, "The Evidence of Aristotle and Xenophon" In Vlastos, Socrates: Ironist and Moral Philosopher, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 81-106.
  • Waterfield, R. , 2006, Xenophon’s Retreat: Greece, Persia, and the End of the Golden Age, London: Faber and Faber.
  • Waterfield, R., 2004, “Xenophon’s Socratic Mission” in Chirstopher Tuplin (ed.) Xenophon and His World, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 79-113.

 

Author Information

Eve A. Browning
Email: ebrownin@d.umn.edu
University of Minnesota Duluth
U. S. A.

Blaise Pascal (1623–1662)

pascal_blaiseBlaise Pascal was a French philosopher, mathematician, scientist, inventor, and theologian. In mathematics, he was an early pioneer in the fields of game theory and probability theory. In philosophy he was an early pioneer in existentialism. As a writer on theology and religion he was a defender of Christianity.

Despite chronic ill health, Pascal made historic contributions to mathematics and to physical science, including both experimental and theoretical work on hydraulics, atmospheric pressure, and the existence and nature of the vacuum. As a scientist and philosopher of science, Pascal championed strict empirical observation and the use of controlled experiments; he opposed the rationalism and logico-deductive method of the Cartesians; and he opposed the metaphysical speculations and reverence for authority of the theologians of the Middle Ages.

Although he never fully abandoned his scientific and mathematical interests, after his uncanny “Night of Fire” (the intense mystical illumination and midnight conversion that he experienced on the evening of November 23, 1654), Pascal turned his talents almost exclusively to religious writing.  It was during the period from 1656 until his death in 1662 that he wrote the Lettres Provinciales and the Pensées. The Lettres Provinciales is a satirical attack on Jesuit casuistry and a polemical defense of Jansenism. The Pensées is a posthumously published collection of unfinished notes for what was intended to be a systematic apologia for the Christian religion. Along with his scientific writings, these two great literary works have attracted the admiration and critical interest of philosophers and serious readers of every generation.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Early Years
    2. First Conversion
    3. Worldly Reversion
    4. Second Conversion
    5. Final Years
    6. Miracle of the Holy Thorn
  2. Literary and Religious Works
    1. Provincial Letters
    2. Pensées
      1. Plan and Purpose of the Work and its Textual History
      2. Philosophical Themes
      3. Between Misery and Grandeur
      4. Critical Approaches and Interpretation
      5. The Wager
    3. Minor Works (Opuscules)
      1. Writings on Grace
      2. On the Geometric Spirit
      3. Discourse on the Passions of Love
      4. Discourses on the Condition of the Great
      5. Prayer on the Proper Use of Sickness
      6. Pascal’s Conversation with M. de Saci on Epictetus and Montaigne
  3. Mathematical and Scientific Works
    1. Conic Sections
    2. Experiments on the Vacuum
    3. Pascal’s Triangle and Probability Theory
    4. Infinity
    5. Solving the Cycloid
  4. Philosophy of Science and Theory of Knowledge
    1. Philosophy of Science
    2. Theory of Knowledge
      1. Reason and Sense
      2. The Heart
  5. Fideism
  6. Existentialism
  7. Conclusion: Pascal’s Reputation and Cultural Legacy
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and translations of works by Pascal
    2. Biographical and critical studies

1. Biography

 “Pascal’s life is inseparable from his work.”—A. J. Krailsheimer

Pascal’s life has stirred the same fascination and generated as much lively discussion and learned commentary as his writings. This is largely attributable to his intriguing, enigmatic personality. To read him is to come into direct contact with both his strangeness and his charm. It is also to encounter a tangle of incongruities and seeming contradictions. For Pascal himself – humble yet forceful; fanatical as well as skeptical; mild and empathetic, yet also capable of withering scorn – personified the very “chimera” he famously declared man to be (Pensées, 131/164).  [Note: Throughout this article, fragments of the Pensées are identified first (that is, before the slash) by the numeration system of Lafuma and second (after the slash) by that of Sellier – L/S.]

Interest in his life is also due to our natural desire to learn more about this “scary genius” , or effrayant génie – Chateaubriand’s memorable phrase, whose unique combination of talents enabled him to make revolutionary contributions not only to mathematics and  physical science but also to the theology and literature of his age. Merely to list his achievements is once again to encounter Pascal the “chimera,”— the human riddle who was both an avant-garde crusader for empirical science as well as an avid supporter of ancient prophecy, mysticism, miracles, and Biblical hermeneutics. Modern readers are usually shocked to discover that the father of gambling odds and the mechanical computer wore a spiked girdle to chastise himself and further mortify a body already tormented by recurrent illness and chronic pain.

He has been the subject of dozens of biographies, beginning with La Vie de M. Pascal, the brief hagiographic sketch composed by his sister Gilberte Périer shortly after his death in 1662 and first published in 1684.  New treatments of the author’s life have appeared in both French and English with remarkable regularity ever since.

Périer’s memoir established a precedent by applying an underlying pattern and symmetry to her brother’s life. The implied form is that of a well-made play with classic five-act structure. In Périer’s treatment this life-drama is a divine comedy showing the spiritual rise and eventual salvation of a distressed soul who, after a series of trials and setbacks, reunites with God. Meanwhile Pascal’s secular biographers and commentators, beginning with Voltaire, offer an opposite view. They portray Pascal’s career as essentially a tragedy, a descending arc tracing the decline into timidity and superstition of a once bold and independent thinker. Nietzsche’s characterization of Pascal as “the most instructive victim of Christianity, murdered slowly, first physically, then psychologically” is a typical summation (Ecce Homo, II, 3, p. 243).

Both views are oversimplified. First of all, at no point during his lifetime was Pascal ever a libertine or libre-penseur. So portraying his life as though it consisted of two sudden and powerful “conversions,” with an intervening slide into worldliness and sins of the flesh, seems a bit too pat and melodramatic. Similarly, since Pascal was a lifelong supporter of the Catholic faith, and since he also maintained an interest in scientific and mathematical problems well after his commitment to Jansenism and Port-Royal, it seems unfair to portray his final years as a betrayal of his scientific principles rather than as an intensification or culmination of his religious views.  Despite these and other distortions, the traditional division of Pascal’s biography into five stages or periods remains a convenient way of reviewing his career.

a. Early Years

Blaise Pascal was born on June 19, 1623, in Clermont (now Clermont-Ferrand) in the Auvergne region of central France. His parents were Étienne Pascal (1588 – 1651), a magistrate, civil servant, and member of the aristocratic and professional class known as the noblesse de robe, and Antoinette Bégon Pascal (1596-1626), the daughter of a Clermont merchant. Pascal was named for his paternal uncle as well as for St. Blaise, the 3rd-century Armenian saint martyred by having his flesh flayed by iron carding combs as his namesake would later punish his own flesh by wearing a belt studded with sharp nails.

The Pascal family, including Pascal’s older sister Gilberte (b. 1620) and younger sister Jacqueline (b. 1625), enjoyed a comfortable, upper-bourgeois lifestyle. Étienne, in addition to being a lawyer, public official, and tax administrator, was proficient in Latin and Greek, a dabbler in natural philosophy, and an expert mathematician. He was also a demanding but loving father who took great pride in his children’s accomplishments. Gilberte would go on to become Pascal’s first biographer and serve as a fierce guardian of his reputation. Jacqueline displayed an early literary genius and earned acclaim as a poet and dramatist before becoming a nun at Port-Royal. Pascal’s mother, who was known for her piety and charitable work, died when Pascal was only three years old and Jacqueline was but an infant.

Pascal was a sickly child who suffered various pains and diseases throughout his life. According to a family anecdote related by his niece, at age one he supposedly fell victim to a strange illness. His abdomen became distended and swollen, and the slightest annoyance triggered fits of crying and screaming. This affliction supposedly continued for more than a year, and the child often seemed on the verge of death.

Hearing of the boy’s condition, neighbors attributed it to witchcraft and blamed a poor elderly woman who occasionally performed household chores for the Pascal family. Étienne, as an educated gentleman, at first scoffed at the accusation, but when his patience eventually wore thin he confronted the woman and threatened her with hanging if she didn’t come forward with the truth. The woman reportedly fell to the floor and promised to divulge everything if her life would be spared. She confessed that in a moment of anger and resentment she had cast a spell on the child – a fatal spell that could be undone only by having it transferred to some other living creature. Supposedly the family cat was given to her and made a scapegoat for the otherwise doomed child. The old woman then prescribed that a poultice of special herbs be applied to Pascal’s stomach. After an intense crisis, during which he appeared to be comatose and close to death, Pascal awoke from his “spell” and eventually recovered his health.

This strange and improbable “witch” tale is scarcely credible today. But that Pascal endured a serious and potentially fatal childhood illness during which his parents desperately tried all kinds of fanciful cures and treatments seems very likely. In fact, the anecdote is perfectly consistent with the wild and paradoxical world of 17th_ century culture and especially the medical practice of the time – a time when empirical science and natural magic, enlightened new techniques and antique superstitions, were routinely intermingled and practiced side by side.

The exact cause and basis of Pascal’s lifelong health problems have never been fully settled or accounted for. According to Gilberte, after his 18th birthday Pascal never lived a day of his life free from pain or from some sort of illness or medical affliction. The most common medical opinion is that he contracted gastrointestinal tuberculosis in early childhood and that manifestations of the disease, along with signs of possible concurrent nephritis or rheumatoid arthritis, recurred periodically throughout his lifetime. The accounts of his pathology are also consistent with migraine, irritable bowel syndrome, and fibromyalgia – a complex of illnesses often found together and which also frequently occur in combination with symptoms of anxiety, depression, and emotional distress.

Scholarly interest in this matter involves more than just idle curiosity and medical detective-work. The question of Pascal’s physical and mental health goes to the heart of desires to learn more about the conditions and circumstances that produce extraordinary genius. Affliction and disease, physical or emotional trauma, a natural disadvantage or disability have often served as an added motive or accelerator for high-level creative achievement. Examples abound – from the ancient legend of the blind and vagabond Homer to the documented histories of modern creative figures like Isaac Newton, Van Gogh, Stephen Hawking, and Christy Brown. We can only speculate whether and to what extent Pascal’s physical ailments and disabilities, instead of retarding his career, may have actually spurred and given rise to his intellectual triumphs.

In 1631, a few years after the death of his wife, Étienne sold his government post (a common practice of the day) along with most of his property and moved with his children to Paris. Over the next nine years he devoted himself to his amateur scientific and mathematical pursuits and took personal charge of his children’s education. Recognizing early on his son’s exceptional intellectual gifts, Étienne designed and supervised a special program and curriculum for the boy based on his own anti-scholastic and progressive educational principles.

Young Pascal was taught Latin and Greek as well as history, geography, and philosophy – all on an impromptu schedule, including during meals and at various hours throughout the day. Science, or natural philosophy as the discipline was then known, ignited Pascal’s imagination, and he demonstrated an early inquisitiveness about natural phenomena and a fondness for devising experiments. Civil and canon law were also part of a varied curriculum that included study of the Bible and the Church Fathers. The latter studies were in accordance with Étienne’s personal religious views, which were plain and respectful and as progressive as his views on education. He taught his son his own cardinal principle that whatever is a matter of faith should not also be treated as a matter of reason; and vice-versa. It is a tenet that Pascal took to heart and followed throughout his career.

In the belief that, once exposed to mathematics, his son would be so captivated by it that he would forsake or ignore his other studies, Étienne determined to withhold instruction in math and geometry until Pascal had completed the rest of his training. However, upon discovering that the boy had already achieved an intuitive understanding of the discipline including his own independently worked out demonstration of a proof in Euclid, Étienne acquiesced. The pages of Euclid were finally opened to the youth, and thus began Pascal’s belated introduction to mathematics – the subject with which he would conduct, at times guiltily, a lifelong love affair.

Pascal’s education was unique for his own time and would be unusual in any era. A passionate student who delved earnestly into each new subject, he absorbed new material, including, at a later period, the most arcane and technical components of theology quickly and effortlessly. However, his learning, while deep in a few areas, was never broad and was in some ways less remarkable for what it included than for what it left out.

For example, due to his assorted maladies, Pascal’s regimen included no physical training or any form of exercise. In addition, because of the sequestered, hermetic, entirely private form of his schooling, he never experienced any of the personal contacts or opportunities for social development that most young people, including even novice monks in monastic schools, commonly do. To what extent this may have deformed or limited his social and interpersonal skills it is hard to say. He was known to be temperamentally impatient with and demanding of others while sometimes seeming arrogant and self-absorbed. At a later point in his career, he fully acknowledged his deficiencies and indeed chastised himself for his social ambition and intellectual vanity.

Pascal was not widely read in the classics or in contemporary literature. Though he was well acquainted with Aristotelian and Scholastic thought, philosophy for him consisted mainly of Epictetus, Montaigne, and the traditional debate between Stoicism and Epicureanism. Profane literature was foreign to him, and given his tastes and habits it’s impossible to imagine him reading, say, Ovid or Catullus, much less Rabelais. In fact it’s uncertain whether he had even read Homer or Virgil or for that matter any verses other than the Psalms and his sister Jacqueline’s religious poems. As for drama, Corneille was a family friend who at one time personally championed Jacqueline’s poetry and dramaturgy, and the young Racine studied classical literature and rhetoric at the school at Port-Royal while Jacqueline and Pascal were also there. Yet Pascal never mentions the work of either great writer and indeed – other than to refer to the stage as a “dangerous diversion” (Pensées, 764/630) – seems to have taken little interest at all in contemporary French theatre, which was then at its artistic zenith.

But whatever he may have lacked in physical education, humanistic studies, and art appreciation, Pascal more than made up for in his favored pursuits. In fact, so rapidly did he advance in physics and mathematics that Étienne boldly introduced the boy at the age of only thirteen into his small Parisian academic circle known as the Académie libre. The central figure of this group was the polymathic philosopher, mathematician, theologian, and music theorist Père Marin Mersenne, one of the leading intellectuals of the age. Mersenne corresponded with Descartes, Huygens, Hobbes, and other luminaries of the period and actively promoted the work of controversial thinkers like Galileo and Gassendi. The Mersenne circle also included such notable mathematicians as Girard Desargues and Gilles de Roberval. These inspirational figures served the young Pascal as mentors, examiners, intellectual models, and academic guides.

It was during his involvement with the Mersenne circle that Pascal published, at age sixteen, his Essai pour les Coniques, an important contribution to the relatively new field of projective geometry. The essay includes an original proof concerning the special properties of hexagons inscribed within conic sections that is still known today as Pascal’s Theorem.

Around the same time that Pascal was working on his Theorem, Étienne, who had at one time served as an adviser to Cardinal Richelieu, incurred the wrath of the First Minister by leading a protest over a government bond default. Threatened with prison, he sought refuge in Auvergne. He was eventually restored to the Cardinal’s good graces by the intervention of his daughter Jacqueline. (The Cardinal, a patron of the theatre, was charmed not only by Jacqueline’s poetic and dramatic skills but also by her beauty and courtly manners.) It’s also likely that Richelieu had an additional motive for welcoming Étienne back. For no sooner was Étienne returned to royal favor than Richelieu appointed him the chief tax administrator for Rouen. At the Cardinal’s behest, the Pascal family moved from Paris to Rouen in early January of 1640.

Rouen was a city in crisis, beset by street violence, crop failures, a tax revolt, and an outbreak of plague. It was Étienne’s job to handle the taxpayer revolt, which he eventually managed to do by working with the local citizens and earning their confidence and respect. Pascal meanwhile seems to have been little affected by the change of scene and continued with his mathematical studies. He also undertook a new project. Impressed by the massive number of calculations required in his father’s work of accounting and tax assessment, he wondered if the drudgery of such labor might not be relieved by some type of mechanical device. Setting to work on the idea in 1642, he eventually conceived, designed, and oversaw the construction of what was presented to the public in 1645 as la machine arithmétique, later known as the Pascaline. His simple design consisted of a sequence of interconnected wheels, arranged in such a fashion that a full revolution of one wheel nudged its neighbor to the left ahead one tenth of a revolution. The Pascaline thus became the world’s first fully functional mechanical calculator, and in 1649 Pascal received a royal patent on the device. Over the next five years he continued tinkering with his design, experimenting with various materials and trying out different linkage arrangements and gear mechanisms. Nine working models survive today and serve as a reminder that Pascal was not just a mathematical Platonist absorbed in a higher world of pure number but also a practical minded, down-to-earth engineering type interested in applying the insights of science and mathematics to the solution of real-world problems.

b. First Conversion

On an icy day in January of 1646, Étienne Pascal, in his capacity as a public official, was summoned to prevent a duel that was to take place in a field outside Rouen. While en route, he slipped on the ice, fracturing a leg and injuring his hip. The family called in two local bonesetters, the brothers Deschamps, who moved into the Pascal household for a period of three months to care for Étienne and oversee his recovery. The brothers turned out to be members of the small, saintly community of Augustinian worshippers established at Port-Royal by the Jansenist priest Jean du Vergier de Hauranne, more simply known as the abbé Saint-Cyran.

The Jansenists (named for the Dutch theologian Cornelius Jansen) accepted the strict Augustinian creed that salvation is achieved not by human virtue or merit but solely by the grace of God. At Port-Royal they practiced an ascetic lifestyle emphasizing penance, austerity, devotional exercises, and good works. While treating Étienne, the Deschamps brothers shared their stringent, exacting, and somewhat cheerless religious views with the Pascal family. Pascal himself, along with his father and sisters, had never displayed much in the way of genuine religious fervor. They were good upper-middle-class Catholics, mild and respectful in their beliefs rather than zealous, neither God-fearing nor, to any extraordinary degree, God-seeking. Yet the ardor of the Deschamps brothers proved contagious. Pascal caught the fire and read with avidity the Jansenist texts that were given to him – sermons by Saint-Cyran along with doctrinal works by Augustine, Antoine Arnauld (Saint-Cyran’s successor), and Jansen himself. Gradually, with growing assurance, and eventually with complete sincerity and conviction, Pascal embraced the Jansenist creed. According to Gilberte’s account, he was the first in the family to convert to the new faith, and no sooner had he done so than he set about to convert the rest of family, first Jacqueline, then Étienne, and finally Gilberte and her husband Florin Périer. It should be added, however, that from Pascal’s own point of view he wasn’t so much “converting” to Jansenism, or any particular group or sect, as he was declaring or reaffirming his commitment to the true faith.

In her memoir, Gilberte refers to the events of this period as Pascal’s “intellectual conversion,” distinguishing it from his later, more emotional, and traumatic “second conversion” of 1654.  She also asserts that at this time Pascal formally renounced all his scientific and mathematical researches and ever afterward devoted himself entirely and exclusively to the love and service of God. This claim is inaccurate and indeed hard to fathom given that only a year later Florin Périer, Gilberte’s own husband, assisted in what is probably Pascal’s most famous scientific investigation, the celebrated Puy-de-Dôme experiment measuring air pressure and proving the existence of the vacuum. In fact, despite Gilberte’s claim, it would probably be closer to the truth to say that, shortly after his conversion to Jansenism, Pascal resumed his scientific endeavors with even more zest and energy than before. In the spring of 1947, partly on the advice of his physicians, he returned to Paris where he linked up once again with former colleagues and began organizing several new essays and treatises for publication. His supposed renunciation of natural philosophy and the bright world of Parisian intellectual life had lasted all of six months.

c. Worldly Reversion

Contrary to Gilberte’s account, most biographers have accepted the years 1649 -1654 as a periode mondaine in Pascal’s career – that is, as a time when he retreated from his pledge to serve only God and resumed to a significant degree the life of a gentleman-scientist.

It was not a period of debauchery and libertinism or anything of the kind. Although he showed an occasional weakness for silk and brocade and enjoyed the amenities of both a valet and a coach-and-six, Pascal did not become a salon habitué or even much of a bon vivant. He was simply a young man who sought the company of fellow experts, savored the spotlight of recognition for personal achievement, and delighted in the social world of learned conversation and sparkling intellectual debate. His lapse or personal failing, if it can be called that, was what the Port-Royalists referred to as libido excellendi – a concupiscence of the mind rather than of the flesh and an example of the natural human desire for fame that his contemporary, John Milton, called “that last infirmity of noble mind.”

Pascal’s companions during this period included such stars of the Paris social scene as Artus Gouffier, the Duc de Roannez, a former military officer, noted courtier, and amateur dabbler in science and mathematics; Antoine Gombaud, the Chevalier de Méré, a soldier, gambler, author, and paragon of honnêteté (more than mere “honesty,” this term connotes an entire code of conduct and the gallant, cheerful lifestyle of an independent-minded man of the world); and Damien Mitton, another champion of honnêteté whose name became a byword for debonair charm and colorful raconteurship. Several commentators on the Pensées argue that the work is directly aimed at the culture of honnêteté and that it specifically targets figures like Méré and Mitton, that is, persons who seek a life of virtue and happiness apart from God.

Shortly after his return to Paris in 1647 and during a turn for the worse in his health, Pascal reunited with his old circle of friends and fellow intellectuals and was also introduced into polite society. Descartes himself paid a visit (and according to reports wisely suggested that Pascal follow a regimen of bed-rest and bouillon rather than the steady diet of enemas, purgings, and blood-lettings favored by his doctors). The historic meeting between the two scientific and philosophical rivals reportedly did not go well.

Pascal’s new life in Paris was interrupted in 1648 by the outbreak of the Fronde, the violent civil clash that began as a power struggle between Chief Minister Mazurin and leaders of Parliament and which continued as a conflict between the crown and various aristocratic factions over the next five years. To escape the mob havoc and pervasive military presence in Paris, Pascal returned to Clermont along with his sisters, brother-in-law, and father. There he effectively inserted himself into the Auvergne equivalent of Parisian high society and resumed his temporary infatuation with la vie honnêteté. He returned to Paris in 1650, reconnected with his old friends, and began revising and polishing several scientific papers, including portions of a never completed or partially lost version of his Treatise on the Vacuum.

On September 24, 1651, Étienne died; he was 63. Pascal and Jacqueline were at his bedside. Gilberte was in Clermont awaiting the birth of a child who would be named Étienne Périer in honor of his grandfather. Pascal’s letter of consolation to Gilberte, preserved among his complete works, has disappointed some of his admirers due to its austere tone and cold Jansenist view of death (we should not grieve but rejoice at God’s will; the deceased is now in a better world; and so forth.). However, the letter includes a note of affection for the man who had taken personal charge of his education and who was the first to introduce him to the world of science and mathematics. Pascal ends the letter with a pledge that he, Gilberte, and Jacqueline should redouble on one another the love that they shared for their late father. A few months later, Jacqueline finally made good on her determination (long postponed in obedience to her father’s and brother’s wishes) to dedicate her life to holy service and enter Port-Royal as a nun.

In the summer of 1654 Pascal exchanged a series of letters with Fermat on the problem of calculating gambling odds and probabilities. It was also at this time (although many have doubted his authorship) that he completed his Discourse on Love. And according to at least two of his biographers (Faugère and Bishop) it was during this same period (1653-54) that Pascal himself fell victim to amorous passion and even contemplated marriage (supposedly to the comely Charlotte de Rouannez, his frequent correspondent and the sister of his good friend the Duke). On the other hand, Gilberte in her account of her brother’s life makes no mention whatsoever of a love affair, and the evidence that Pascal ever succumbed to romance or became a suitor remains sketchy at best.

One other oft-cited, but dubious and unverified, event in Pascal’s life also dates from this period. According to various sources, none wholly reliable, in October of 1654, Pascal was supposedly involved in a nearly fatal accident while crossing the Pont de Neuilly in his coach. His affrighted horses reportedly reared, bolted, and plunged over the side of the bridge into the Seine, nearly dragging the coach and Pascal after them. Fortunately, the main coupling broke and the coach, with Pascal inside, miraculously hung on to the edge and stabilized.

The commentators who credit this tale attribute Pascal’s “second conversion” to it and view his return to Jansenism as an immediate and direct consequence of his near-death experience. Sigmund Freud accepted the story and even used it as an example of how severe trauma can trigger an obsessive or phobic reaction. However, there is no conclusive evidence that the event ever happened.

d. Second Conversion

The crucial event of Pascal’s life and career occurred on November 23, 1654, between the hours of 10:30 pm and 12:30 am. Pascal lay in bed at his home in the Marais district in Paris when he experienced the religious ecstasy or revelation that his biographers refer to as his “second conversion” or “night of fire.” He produced a written record of this momentous experience on a sheet of paper, which he then inserted into a piece of folded parchment inscribed with a duplicate account of the same vision. This dual record, known as the Memorial, he kept sewed into the lining of his jacket as a kind of secret token or private testament of his new life and total commitment to Jesus Christ. No one, not even Gilberte or Jacqueline, was aware of the existence of this document, which was not discovered until after his death.

The text of the Memorial is cryptic, ejaculatory, portentous. At the top of the sheet stands a cross followed by a few lines establishing the time and date, then the word FEU (fire) in all upper case and centered near the top of the page. Then:

Dieu d'Abraham, Dieu d'Isaac, Dieu de Jacob, non des philosophes et des savants.

Certitude. Certitude. Sentiment. Joie. Paix.

Dieu de Jésus-Christ.

Deum meum et Deum vestrum.

Ton Dieu sera mon Dieu.

(God of Abraham, God of Isaac, God of Jacob, not of the philosophers and scholars. Certitude, certitude, feeling, joy, peace. God of Jesus Christ. My God and your God. Thy God will be my God.)

And so on, in a similarly ecstatic vein for about eighteen more lines. The parchment copy ends with the solemn pledge: “Total submission to Jesus Christ and to my director. Eternally in joy for a day’s trial on earth. I shall not forget thy word.”

As the name Memorial implies, Pascal’s words were written down to preserve them indelibly in his memory and to bear tangible witness to what was for him a soul-piercing and truly life-altering event. His account, despite its brevity and gnomic style, accords closely with the reports of conversion and mysticism classically described and analyzed by William James.

In the weeks leading up to November 23, 1654, Pascal had on several occasions visited Jacqueline at Port-Royal and had complained, despite his active social life and ongoing scientific work, of feelings of dissatisfaction, guilt, lack of purpose, and ennui. As in the story of his carriage accident by the Seine, he seemed to be a man teetering on the edge – in this case between anxiety and hope. His “Night of Fire” dramatically changed his outlook and brought him back from the brink of despair.

e. Final Years

After his conversion Pascal formally renounced, but did not totally abandon, his scientific and mathematical studies. He instead vowed to dedicate his time and talents to the glorification of God, the edification of his fellow believers, and the salvation of the larger human community. It wasn’t long before he got an early test of his new resolve.

In fact, hardly had Pascal committed himself to Port-Royal than the Jansenist enclave, never secure and always under the watchful suspicion of the greater Catholic community, found itself under theological siege.  Antoine Arnauld, the spiritual leader of Port-Royal and the uncompromising voice and authority for its strict Augustinian beliefs and values, was embroiled in a bitter controversy pitting Jansenism against the Pope, the Jesuit order, and a majority of the bishops of France. In effect, opponents charged that the entire Jansenist system was based on a foundation of error. At issue were matters of Catholic doctrine involving grace, election, human righteousness, divine power, and free will. Arnauld denied the charges and published a series of vehement counter-attacks. Unfortunately, these only served to make the hostility towards himself and the Port-Royal community more intense. He ended up being censored by the Faculty of Theology at the Sorbonne and stood threatened with official accusations of heresy. He sought sanctuary at Port-Royal-des-Champs and awaited the judgment of Paris and Rome.

With the official voice of Port-Royal effectively muted, the cause of Jansenism needed a new champion. Pascal stood ready to fill the role. During the period 1656-57, under the pseudonym Louis de Montalte,

he produced a series of 18 public letters attacking the Jesuits and defending Arnauld and Jansenist doctrine. The Lettres provinciales, as they became known, introduced an entirely new tone and style into contemporary theological debate. From time to time, the genre had served as a forum for obfuscation, vituperation, abstruse technical language, and stodgy academic prose. Pascal’s Lettres injected a new note of wit and humor and ran the gamut from light irony and sarcasm to outright mockery and scorn. They also featured a popular idiom and conversational tone and made use of literary devices such as characterization, dialog, dramatization, and narrative voice. They became a sensation and attracted the amused attention of readers throughout France. Who, people wondered, is this clever fellow Montalte? The Jesuits, stunned and slow to respond, seemed to have met their intellectual match.

f. Miracle of the Holy Thorn

During the same week that Pascal’s fifth provinciale (a polemic against Jesuit casuistry) was published, and just when rumors of new antagonism and royal disfavor with Jansenism began to circulate, an extraordinary event occurred at Port-Royal. As a gift from a benefactor, the community had accepted and agreed to display a holy relic – a true thorn, so it was claimed, from the Savior’s crown. Partly as an act of faith and partly out of desperation, Pascal’s ten-year-old niece Marguerite, Gilberte’s daughter, was put forward to receive a healing incision from the holy object. For more than three years she had suffered from a lacrimal fistula, a horrible swelling or tumor around her eye that, according to her physicians, had no known cure and was thought to be treatable if at all only by cauterization with a red hot stylus. Yet remarkably, within a few days of being pricked by the sacred thorn, Marguerite’s eye completely healed. The seeming miracle excited the Pascal family and the entire Port-Royal community; news of the event soon spread outside the walls of Port-Royal and around the nation. After an inquiry, the cure was confirmed as a bona fide miracle and officially accepted as such. Port-Royal rejoiced, and for a while the antagonism against it from the larger Catholic community abated. Pascal regarded the miracle as a sign of divine favor for his Lettres project and for the cause of Jansenism in general. It also confirmed his belief in miracles, a belief that would form part of the foundation for his view of religious faith as set forth in the Pensées.  

Despite the auspicious sign of heavenly favor, and even though the Lettres were brilliantly successful in the short term, they failed in their ultimate goal of vindicating Arnauld and Port-Royal. A papal “bull” condemning Jansenism was issued by Alexander VII in October of 1656 and approved in France in December of 1657. An official oath decreeing that Jansenist doctrine was contaminated by heresy was circulated and all French priests, monks, and nuns, including the Port-Royalists and Pascal’s sister Jacqueline, were compelled to sign. In 1660 the “little schools” of Port Royal, renowned for excellence and models of progressive education, were closed. In 1661 the monastery was no longer allowed to accept novices. Early in the next century the abbey would be abolished, the community of worshippers disbanded, and the buildings razed. Overwhelmed by a combined force of royal politics and papal power, Port-Royal would lie in ruins and Jansenism, though it would inspire a few random offshoots and latter-day imitations, would find itself largely reduced to an interesting but brief chapter in the history of French Catholicism.

Meanwhile, in the spring of 1658, as he was studying the Bible and doing preparatory work for what was to be his magnum opus – the great Apology for Christianity that would become the Pensées – Pascal turned his attention once again to mathematics and to the problem of the roulette or cycloid. Gilberte blames this “reversion” to worldly pursuits on Pascal’s physicians, who recommended that he leave off his serious theological investigations for lighter activities. She also claims that the solution to the problem, which had challenged the likes of Galileo, Torricelli, and Descartes, came to him almost despite himself and during a bout of sleeplessness caused by a toothache. She finally alleges that Pascal decided to make his discovery public only when he was at length persuaded by others that it was God’s will. Gilberte’s claims are questionable. What is known is that when Pascal, under the pseudonym Amos Dettonville, actually did publish his solution, which was done within the context of a contest or challenge that he had thrown out to some of the best mathematical minds of Europe, the result was a controversy that occupied his time and energy for several months and which distracted him from working on his new project.

The Pensées occupied Pascal’s final years and were undertaken at a time when his health, which was never robust, deteriorated and grew progressively worse. Originally conceived as a comprehensive defense of the Christian faith against non-believers, the work in its existing form is a rich assortment of notes, fragments, aphorisms, homilies, short essays, sermonettes, and aperçus that even in their disorganized and unfinished state constitute a powerful and fascinating contribution to philosophy, theology, and literary art.

Pascal worked determinedly on the Pensées to the extent that his health permitted him, which was unfortunately not very often or for very long. By early 1659 he was already seriously ill and could work for only short spurts before succumbing to mental and physical exhaustion. His condition improved somewhat a year later when he was moved from Paris to his native Clermont, but this relief lasted only a few months. When he returned to Paris he mustered enough energy to work out his plan for a public shuttle system of omnibuses for the city. When this novel idea was realized and put into actual operation in 1662, Paris had the first such transit system in the world.

The last two years of Pascal’s life were spent in Paris under the care and supervision of Gilberte and Florin, who had taken a home nearby. It was a grim period for all the Pascals; Jacqueline died in 1661, only a few months after being forced to subscribe to the formulary condemning Jansen’s Augustinus as heretical. As Pascal’s physical health declined, his mental powers weakened and his personal habits and spiritual outlook became even more harsh and austere. According to Gilberte, he regarded any sort of dining pleasure or gastronomic delight as a hateful form of sensuality and adopted the (very un-Gallic) view that one should eat strictly for nourishment and not for enjoyment. He championed the ideal of poverty and claimed that one should prefer and use goods crafted by the poorest and most honest artisans, not those manufactured by the best and most accomplished. He purged his home of luxuries and pretty furnishings and took in a homeless family. He even cautioned Gilberte not to be publicly affectionate with her children – on grounds that caresses can be a form of sensuality, dependency, and self-indulgence. In his opinion, a life devoted to God did not allow for close personal attachments – not even to family.

During his last days he burned with fever and colic. His doctors assaulted him with their customary cures. He wavered in and out of consciousness and suffered a series of recurrent violent convulsions. However, Gilberte attests that he recovered his clarity of mind in time to make a final confession, take the Blessed Sacrament, and receive extreme unction. His last coherent words were reportedly “May God never abandon me.” He died at 1:00 AM August 19, 1662, at the age of 39.

Even post-mortem Pascal was unable to escape the curiosity and intrusiveness of his physicians. Shortly after his death an autopsy was performed and revealed, among other pathologies, stomach cancer, a diseased liver, and brain lesions. Nor after death, was he granted peace from the still ongoing crossfire between Jesuits and Port-Royal. Was Pascal, it was asked, truly orthodox and a good Catholic? A sincere believer and supporter of the powers of the Pope and the priesthood and the efficacious intervention of the Saints? Did he reject the Jansenist heresy on his deathbed and accept a more moderate and forgiving theology? Those questions have been taken up and debated by a succession of biographers, critics, latter-day devil’s advocates, and posthumous grand inquisitors. His works have fared better, having received, during the three and a half centuries since his death, first-rate editorial attention, a number of superb translations, and an abundance of expert scholarly commentary. The Pensées and the Provincial Letters have earned him a place in the pantheon of French philosophical non-fiction alongside names like Montaigne, Descartes, Voltaire, Rousseau, and Sartre.

2. Literary and Religious Works

a. Provincial Letters

Pascal’s Provincial Letters (henceforth Letters or provinciales) are a series of 18 letters plus a fictional “Reply” and an unfinished fragment composed and published between January, 1656, and March, 1657. Their aim was to defend the Jansenist community of Port-Royal and its principal spokesman and spiritual leader Antoine Arnauld from defamation and accusations of heresy while at the same time leading a counter-offensive against the accusers (mainly the Jesuits). Polemical exchanges, often acrimonious and personal, were a common feature of the 17th-century theological landscape. Pascal ventured into this particular fray with a unique set of weapons – a mind honed by mathematical exercise and scientific debate, a pointed wit, and sharp-edged literary and dramatic skills.

In the background of the letters stand two notable events:  (1) In May of 1653, Pope Innocent X in a bull entitled Cum Occasione declared five propositions supposedly contained in Cornelius Jansen’s Augustinus to be heretical.  (2) In January of 1656, after a long and heated trial, Arnauld, who had repeatedly denied that the five propositions were in Jansen’s text, was officially censured and expelled from the Sorbonne.

The five propositions can be stated as follows:

1. Even the just, no matter how hard they may strive, lack the power and grace to keep all the commandments.

2. In our fallen condition it is impossible for us to resist interior grace.

3. In order to deserve merit or condemnation we must be free from external compulsion though not from internal necessity.

4. It is heresy to say that we can either accept grace or resist it.

5. Christ did not die for everyone, but only for the elect.

Two separate questions were at stake: (1) Are the propositions actually in Jansen, if not explicitly and verbatim, then implicitly in meaning or intention? This was the so-called question of fact (de fait). (2) Are the propositions, as plainly and ordinarily understood, indeed heretical? This was the question of right or law (de droit). The Port-Royal position was yes in the case of the second question, no in the case of the first. Arnauld claimed that the propositions do not occur, verbatim or otherwise, anywhere in Jansen’s text, but he acknowledged that if they did occur there (or for that matter anywhere), they were indeed heretical. Despite the fact that he disavowed any support for the five propositions, he and the Port-Royal community as a whole stood under suspicion of secretly approving, if not openly embracing them.

Such was the situation that Pascal found himself in when he sat down to compose the first provinciale. What he produced was something utterly new in the annals of religious controversy. In place of the usual fury and technical quibbling, he adopts a tone of easy-going candor and colloquial simplicity. He presents himself as a modest, ordinary, private citizen (originally anonymous, but later identified in the collected letters by the pseudonym Louis de Montalte) who is writing from Paris to a “provincial friend.” “Montalte’s” purpose is to pass along his personal observations, insights, and commentary on the learned and mighty disputes that recently took place at the Sorbonne. In essence, via his fictional persona, Pascal provides an account of l’affaire Arnauld and the case against Jansenism as viewed by a coolly observant, playful outsider.

In the course of the letter, Pascal/Montalte introduces a series of fictional interlocutors who explain or advocate for the Jansenist, Jesuit, and Thomistic views on a range of theological issues, most notably the doctrines of sufficient grace vis-à-vis efficacious grace and the notion of proximate power. These happen to be exactly the sort of deeply esoteric, highly technical, theological matters that “Montalte” and his “provincial friend” (and thus, by extension and more importantly, his target audience of plain-spoken, commonsense, fellow citizens) were likely to find strained, incomprehensible, and somewhat silly. Through devices of interview and dialogue Montalte manages to present these issues in relatively clear, understandable terms and persuade the reader that the Jansenist and Thomist views on each are virtually identical and perfectly orthodox. He goes on to show that any apparent discrepancy between the two positions – and in fact the whole attack on Jansenism and Arnauld – is based not on doctrine, but is entirely political and personal, a product of Jesuit calumny and conspiracy.  In effect, a complicated theological conflict is presented in the form of a simple human drama. Irony and stinging satire are delivered with the suave aplomb of a Horatian epistle.

Not all of the provinciales deal with the same issues and concerns as the first. Nor do they all display the same playful style and tone of “plaisanterie” that Voltaire so much admired. In fact some of the later letters, far from being breezy and affable, are passionate and achieve sublime eloquence; others are downright vicious and blistering in their attack. Letters 1-3 offer a defense of Arnauld, challenging his trial and censure. Letter 4, pitting a Jesuit against a Jansenist, serves as a bridge between provinciales 1-3 and 5-10. Letters 5-10 attack Jesuit casuistry and doctrine; in them Montalte accuses the Society of hypocrisy and moral laxity and of placing ease of conscience and the glory of the Order above true Christian duty and love of God. Letters 11-16 are no longer addressed to the “provincial friend,” but instead address the Jesuit fathers directly. Letter 14 includes an extended discussion of both natural and divine law and makes an important ethical distinction between homicide, capital punishment, and suicide. Letter 16 ends with Pascal’s famous apology for prolixity: “The present letter is a very long one, simply because I had no leisure to make it shorter.”) Letters 17 and 18 are addressed to Father Annat, SJ, confessor to the King, and are direct and personal. Here Pascal virtually abandons the artifice of “Montalte” and seems almost to come forward in his own person. In Letter 17, a virtual reprise and summation of the case of the five propositions, he repeats once again that he writes purely as a private citizen and denies that he is a member of Port Royal. Since Pascal was neither a monk nor a solitaire within the community, the claim is technically accurate, though it arguably leaves him open to the same charges of truth-bending and casuistry that he levels against the Jesuits.

Although the Letters gained a wide readership and enjoyed a period of popular success, they failed to achieve their strategic goal of preserving Port-Royal and Jansenist doctrine from external attack. They also had a few unfortunate, unintended consequences. They were blamed, for instance, for stirring up cynicism, disrespect, and even contempt for the clergy in the minds of ordinary citizens. Quickly translated into English and Latin, they also became popular with Protestant readers happy to extend Pascal’s wounding attack on Jesuit morality into a satirical broadside against Catholicism as a whole. After the publication of the provinciales, the term Jesuitical would become synonymous with crafty and subtle and the words casuistry and casuistical would never again be entirely free from a connotation of sophistry and excuse-making. Banned by order of Louis XIV in 1660 and placed on the Index and burned by the Inquisition, the provinciales nevertheless lived on underground and abroad with their popularity undimmed.

Today, the provinciales retain documentary value both as relics of Jansenism and as surviving specimens of 17th-century religious polemic, but modern readers prize them mainly for their literary excellence. They represent the original model not only for the genre of satirical non-fiction, but for classic French prose style in all other genres as well. Rabelais and Montaigne were basically inimitable and far too quirky and idiosyncratic to serve as a style model for later writers. Pascal’s combination of brisk clarity and concise elegance set a pattern for French authors from La Rochefoucauld, Voltaire, and Diderot to Anatole France. Even Paul Valéry, arguably Pascal’s most severe critic, excoriated his predecessor in a prose style heavily indebted to him. Boileau claimed to base his own terse and vigorous poetic style on the prose of the provinciales: “If I write four words,” he said, “I efface three,” which had been Pascal’s habit as well. Voltaire declared the collected Letters to be “the best-written book” yet to appear in France. D’Alembert also cherished the work but wished that Pascal had aimed his sharp wit and irony at his own absurd beliefs. He argued that Jansenism is every bit as “shocking,” and as deserving of scorn and ridicule, as the doctrines of Molina and the Jesuits. Of Pascal’s modern readers only the arch conservative Joseph de Maistre, spearhead of the counter-Enlightenment, utterly scorned the work, calling Jansenism a “vile” and “unblushing” heresy and finding the style of the Letters rancorous and bitter.

In the end, it’s unfortunate that the principal debate in the provinciales was theological rather than philosophical, for it would have been useful and interesting to have Pascal’s candid discussion of free will vs. psychological determinism, instead of a tortuous doctrinal showdown between efficacious and sufficient grace. Jansen’s own formula – that “man irresistibly, although voluntarily, does either good or evil, according as he is dominated by grace or by concupiscence” – is paradoxical and tries to have it both ways. (Can an act be both voluntary and irresistible?) Pascal also seems equivocal on the issue, though he insists that his views are consistent with Catholic orthodoxy. He wrestled with the problem of grace and free will not only in the Letters, but also in portions of the Pensées and especially in his Écrits sur la grâce (1657-58), where he offers an extensive commentary on Augustine and compares the Calvinist, Jansenist, and Jesuit views. However, even there his account is abstruse and theological rather than blunt and philosophical and is thus of interest mainly to specialists rather than general readers.

b. Pensées

i. Plan and Purpose of the Work and its Textual History

The Pensées are a rarity among literary and philosophical works – a magnum opus by a major author that has achieved classic status despite being unfinished, fragmentary, and almost scrapbook-like in form. The Aeneid, The Canterbury Tales, De Rerum Natura, Kafka’s manuscripts all had work remaining or were incomplete when their authors died, but they seem like final drafts compared to the Pensées. Sainte-Beuve compared the work to a tower in which the stones have been piled up but not cemented. The text, as we have it today, represents the assembled notes, fragments, miscellaneous aphorisms, and short essays-in-progress of what was to be a detailed and comprehensive Apology for Christianity – a defense of the faith against atheism, deism, libertinism, pagan philosophy, and the cult of honnêteté.

Inspired by the force and certainty of his own conversion and by the late excitement of the Holy Thorn, Pascal was further encouraged by the recent success of the provinciales. Confident in his powers of argument and persuasion, both logical and literary, he felt called upon to undertake a bold new project. The new work was to be nothing less than a definitive affirmation and justification of Christianity against its detractors and critics. It would also be an exercise in spiritual outreach and proselytization – an earnest appeal, addressed to both the reason and the heart, inviting scoffers, doubters, the undecided, and the lost to join the Catholic communion. In the Pensées, Pascal would assume the role of both Apologist and Apostle.

In the spring of 1658, he presented a detailed outline of his project, explaining its scope and goals, to an audience of friends and members of Port-Royal. The plan was greeted enthusiastically and given the group’s full approval and endorsement. The work would be unified, but layered and textured, with multiple sections and two main parts:

First part: Misery of man without God.

Second part: Happiness of man with God.

or

First part: That nature is corrupt. Proved by nature itself.

Second part: That there is a Redeemer. Proved by Scripture. (6/40).

The project was designed as an example of what is today termed immanent apologetics. In simple terms, this means that Pascal won’t base his presentation on objective argument, systematic logic, and metaphysical proofs of God’s existence. Indeed, except for a few instances, such as 135/167, where he finds evidence in nature for a Being who is “necessary, infinite, and eternal,” Pascal eschews most of the traditional proofs of God, even Augustine’s. He will instead appeal to the unfolding history of the Christian faith from its roots in Old Testament prophecy through its early development to the modern Church. Further, he will appeal directly to the subjective human spirit and to each reader’s personal experience, emphasizing our existential human need for God and our feelings of incompleteness and wretchedness apart from Him.

In essence, Pascal will leave it to readers to decide whether his account of the human condition and his descriptions of their social and physical worlds (not as they might wish them to be, but as they actually experience them in our daily lives) are credible and persuasive. If the reader accepts his accounts, Pascal will be halfway to his goal. It will remain for him to further convince readers that the solution to our wretchedness, to the disorder and unfairness of life, is acceptance of Jesus Christ. He will argue that not only is belief in Christianity not contrary to reason, but that it’s the only religion that is fully compatible with it. To support this claim, he will offer historical evidence in its favor from the authority of Scripture and ancient witnesses, and also in the form of miracles, prophecies, and figural (typological) hermeneutics. However, he admits that this evidence will not be conclusive – for Christianity can never be proved by reason or authority alone. It must be accepted in the heart (coeur – a special term in Pascal’s vocabulary that includes connotations of “spirit,” “soul,” “natural human instinct,” and even “love,”): “It is the heart which experiences God, and not the reason. This, then, is faith: God felt by the heart, not by the reason” (424/680).

Such in essence was the plan. Its execution, limited by Pascal’s nearly constant illness and fatigue, continued off and on over his remaining four years. Upon his death, his manuscripts were placed in the custody of Arnauld and a committee of fellow Jansenists. While transcribing the manuscripts, the committee produced two variant copies. The original Port Royal edition of Pascal’s works came out in 1670, incomplete and carefully screened to avoid offending the government. Prosper Faugère brought out a revised and authoritative edition of the work in 1844. Several new editions, with different arrangements of the material, appeared over the next century. The numerical ordering used in Léon Brunschvicg’s 1897 edition became standard, but was superseded first by the 1951 edition of Louis Lafuma (which was based on the First Copy) and then again by the 1976 edition of Phillipe Sellier (which was based on the Second Copy). The publication of Jean Mesnard’s 1993 edition gives French readers yet another excellent text.

ii. Philosophical Themes

Death, God, infinity, the nature of the universe, the limits of reason, the meaning of life – these are just a few of the big ideas and philosophical topics that Pascal reflects on in the short space of the Pensées. Indeed, other than the gnomic fragments of Heraclitus or the terse aphoristic texts of Wittgenstein, it’s hard to think of a work that packs as many provocative philosophical musings into so few pages.

Yet even with its multiple subject headings and wide range of topics, the work can still be read as the deep exploration of a single great theme: the Human Condition, viewed under its two opposing yet interrelated aspects – our wretchedness without God, and our greatness with Him. Pascal argues that without God our spiritual condition is essentially a state of misery characterized by anxiety, alienation, loneliness, and ennui.  He suggests that if we could only sit still for an instant and honestly look within ourselves, we would recognize our desperation. However, we spend most of our time blocking out or concealing our true condition from ourselves via forms of self-deception and amour-propre. (Like Augustine before him, Pascal accurately describes mechanisms of denial and ego-defense long before they were clinically and technically defined by Sigmund Freud).

Chief among these ego-protective devices is divertissement (distraction or diversion), Pascal’s term for our continual need and almost addictive tendency to seek out mindless or soul-numbing forms of entertainment and amusement. Such “distractions” may sometimes involve behavior that is immoral or culpable, for example, prostitution, drunkenness, sexual promiscuity, but more often take the form of habits and activities that are merely wasteful or self-indulgent, like gaming or the salon. They may even consist of pastimes that are basically innocent, but which are nevertheless vain, trivial, or unedifying, for example, sports like tennis and fencing. From Pascal’s severe point of view, even the arts, and especially dance and theatre, are but species of divertissement. So are all the luxuries, consumer goods, and worldly delights with which we proudly surround ourselves. According to Pascal, we use these goods and activities not, as we self-flatteringly suppose, to certify our achievements or add a touch of bonheur to our inner life. On the contrary, we use them mainly as a way of concealing our bleak inner reality from ourselves and from one another. They are a means of denying our own mortality and hollowness.  (136/168; 139/171.)

iii. Between Misery and Grandeur

In effect diversions prevent us from acknowledging our essential misery.  They create a false sense of security that hides the abyss or vacuum within. On the other hand, wretchedness and insecurity are only part of our nature. Our condition, as Pascal points out repeatedly in the Pensées and also in his “conversation” with Sacy, is dual.  We are one part misery and one part grandeur; and alongside our feelings of isolation and destitution we also have a profound sense of our intrinsic dignity and worth. Pascal calls us “thinking reeds,” though his stress is on thinking. For thought, he argues, is the whole basis of our dignity, the attribute of our nature that elevates and separates us from the rest of the material universe. It’s an accident of history that Pascal’s collection of notes came to be called Pensées. But the title is appropriate, since the work as a whole could well be described as an extended meditation on human consciousness, on what it means to think.

iv. Critical Approaches and Interpretation

Criticism and interpretation of the Pensées have followed two main approaches. The first, which could be called the conventional or historical approach, is the one favored by most literary scholars and historians of religion, including most notably Philippe Sellier, David Wetsel, and Jean Mesnard. According to this view the Pensées are to be understood within the context and framework of traditional Christian apologetics. Moreover, the author’s original design and purpose (so far as modern scholarship can determine them) are to be carefully reconstructed and fully respected. Most of the biographers and critics who follow this approach agree that Pascal’s primary purpose was to articulate and defend Christianity – and especially the Augustinian-Jansenist form of Christianity practiced at Port-Royal – against its skeptical, atheistic, and deistic opponents.  In particular, they argued, Pascal aims to convert the contemporary free-thinker and honnête homme – that is to say, a figure much like his friends Mitton  and Méré and indeed not unlike a secular, rationalistic, and worldly version of himself. The work is thus understood to be not an inner drama enacting Pascal’s own personal struggles with religious belief but rather an artfully contrived dialog with and rhetorical proselytization of an imagined adversary. The “I” of the work, in this view, is not Pascal himself in propria persona but a polyphonic fiction – a range of literary voices and masks adopted by Pascal strictly as a rhetorical device and as a means of persuasion. Thus, any time we seem to hear the narrative voice of the Pensées expressing fear, doubt, conflict, or existential agony we are to understand that voice not as Pascal’s own, but as that of a literary creation or persona whose utterances are to be interpreted ironically or as presented for dramatic or rhetorical effect.

Although he was neither a literary scholar nor a historian of religion (but more like a cantankerous version of each), Voltaire seems to have read and understood the Pensées in this traditional way. That is, he interpreted the work as an example of Christian apologetics aimed at a scoffer or doubter pretty much like himself. Needless to say, he was not swayed by Pascal’s arguments. To the claim that the human condition is one of anxiety and wretchedness, he responds that we are neither as wicked nor as miserable as Pascal says. As for Pascal’s extensive discussion of miracles, prophecy, the figurative interpretation of Scripture, and the like, Voltaire regards the effort as so much wasted breath. He even suggests that Christianity would be better off without such strained and overwrought apologetics, which he compared to trying to prop up an oak tree by surrounding it with reeds.

The poet and critic T. S. Eliot, in his 1933 introductory essay to the Pensées, also interprets the work in this traditional way.  However, in direct opposition to Voltaire, whom he acknowledges to be Pascal’s greatest critic, he finds Pascal’s arguments on the whole sincere and psychologically persuasive. He departs from the traditional reading only to the extent that he considers the Pensées  not only as a work of Christian apologetics but also as an example of spiritual biography, an expression of Pascal’s forceful and idiosyncratic personality and unique combination of passion and intellect (360).

In opposition to this essentially historical and scholarly way of reading the Pensées, several critics and commentators, from Chateaubriand and Walter Pater to Paul Valéry, AJ Krailsheimer, and Lucien Goldmann, have offered versions of what might be called a “romantic,” “confessional,” or “phenomenological” approach. According to this line of interpretation, Pascal’s fragmentary narrative represents either a fictional portrait of a soul in crisis or a true personal confession in the manner of Augustine (and later Rousseau). That is, it presents a cri de coeur or cri de triomphe that provides a direct look into the heart and soul of a penitent former sinner who, after a long and agonizing struggle, finds Christ and renounces the world. Romantic readers themselves disagree on the extent to which this exercise in self-revelation is a conscious product – that is, a carefully arranged and skillfully made artifact – or, in a more psychoanalytic vein, the expression of the author’s actual inner conflicts and unconscious motives and intentions. They also offer different interpretations of the audience or addressee of the work. Are the Pensées a dramatic monologue? A private confession addressed to God? A dialog between Pascal and the reader? Between Pascal and himself?  Are they truly intended to convert a Méré or a Mitton, and are they addressed only to skeptics and those lacking faith?  Or are they meant also as a meditative exercise and inspiration for active Christians, a spiritual tool to help guide believers and strengthen their faith? Or perhaps Pascal, in the manner of St. Paul, is trying to be all things to all people and thus to a certain extent trying to do some or all of the above at the same time?

The great Victorian critic Walter Pater compares the Pensées to Shakespearian tragedy and notes that Pascal is not a converted skeptic or former infidel who has seen the light. Instead, he seems caught “at the very centre of a perpetually maintained tragic crisis holding the faith steadfastly, but amid the well-poised points of essential doubt all around him.” The Pensées, Pater goes on to claim, dramatize an intense inner dialectic: “no mere calm supersession of a state of doubt by a state of faith; the doubts never die, they are only just kept down in a perpetual agonia.”

This view of the Pensées as an interior dialogue or psychomachia dramatizing Pascal’s own personal struggle between faith and doubt is thoroughly rejected by Jean Mesnard and other scholars who insist that any hint of such a struggle is merely a rhetorical pose on Pascal’s part and employed for dramatic effect.

Pascal was proclaimed a heretic and a Calvinist during his lifetime and has been called everything from a skeptic to a nihilist by modern readers. So to a certain extent Paul Valéry in his controversial essay “Variations on a Pensée” was for the most part only repeating criticisms of the author  that earlier critics, many of them Catholic clergymen, had made before (for example, that he was a poor theologian, that he was insensitive to natural beauty and to art, and so forth). Valéry seems to recognize a distinction between Pascal the author and the “I” of the Pensées, but he finds the “I” of the work so artificial and overwrought that he accuses the author of being hypocritical and insincere. Thinking of the passage in the Pensées about the terror induced by “the eternal silence” of infinite space (201/233), he says, here is a “strange Christian,” who gazes upon the starry heavens yet fails to discover his Heavenly Father. Echoing a criticism formerly made by Voltaire, Valéry likens Pascal to a tragic poet who portrays the human condition as much bleaker and harsher than it actually is; who describes the fears and torments of life vividly, but who depicts its delights and joys, its moments of excitement and intensity, hardly at all.

Lucien Goldmann has argued that the fragmentary form of the Pensées may be an accident due to Pascal’s death, but it also qualifies as a brilliantly achieved creative product, an aesthetically and psychologically appropriate form that not only reflects the true style and state of mind of Pascal himself and of his narrative persona but also captures the mood and temper of his time. Writing from a Lukácsian-Marxist and evolutionary perspective that he calls “genetic structuralism,” Goldmann views Pascal as both a cutting-edge, creative force and at the same time a product of his personal circumstances and historical era. In this interpretation, Pascal sets up dialectical polarities in the Pensées –man’s wretchedness vs. his greatness; concupiscence vs. godliness and sacrifice; Old Testament type vs. New Testament antitype; reason vs. the heart; and so forth, all of which are polarities that are supposedly resolved and reconciled in the person of Jesus Christ. Those polarities are homologous with and paralleled by the larger historical oppositions of the period: the new science vs. ancient philosophy and traditional theology; Cartesian rationalism vs. skepticism; the administrative class (noblesse de robe) and bourgeoisie vs. the nobility; Protestantism and Jansenism vs. Catholicism; and so forth. Viewed in this way, the Pensées can be seen to encapsulate and effectively dramatize the main intellectual and social dynamics of an entire era.

v. The Wager

One of the more remarkable developments in Western philosophy is the fact that one sliver of the Pensées , a single fragment of a fragmentary text and but a small portion of the untidy, multi-part, unfinished work that contains it, has achieved a full literary life of its own, with its own lively history of commentary and criticism. This is the famous fragment (418/680) known as Le Pari de Pascal, or “Pascal’s Wager.”  Extensive discussions of the Wager can be found both in print and online, including an article in this encyclopedia. These discussions address a range of issues relating to the Wager, such as its status in the development of decision theory and probability theory, the various objections that have been made against it, and the numerous revised or alternate versions and applications that have been derived from it. This section will take up only two matters related to the topic: (1) the question of whether or not Pascal himself sincerely approved the Wager and believed that it presents a legitimate and persuasive argument for faith in God; (2) the response to the Wager on the part of a few selected philosophers and critics along with a glance at some of its precedents in literary history.

Simply characterized, the Wager is a second-person dialog in which Pascal imagines an individual forced to choose between belief in God and disbelief in Him. He analyzes the situation as if the reader-protagonist (the “you” of the imaginary dialog) were involved in a great existential coin-toss game.  The conditions and possible outcomes of the Wager are presented in the following table:

You bet that He exists You bet that He does not exist
God exists + ∞ (infinite gain) - ∞ (infinite loss)
God does not exist - x (finite loss) + x (finite gain)

Pascal argues that given the terms of the Wager it is not simply prudent, it is practically obligatory to bet on God’s existence and illogical and utterly foolish to bet against Him. For consider: if you bet on His existence, you stand to win an infinite reward (an eternity in paradise) at the risk of only a small loss (whatever earthly pleasures you would be required to forego during your mortal life). On the other hand, if you bet against His existence, you risk the possibility of an infinite loss (loss of paradise – along with the possibility of an eternity in Hell) for only a limited gain (the opportunity to enjoy a few years’ worth of worldly delights). 

Pascal was a lifelong Catholic whose personal conversion from lukewarm to whole-hearted faith was accomplished not by rational argument but by a life-changing mystical experience. So it’s unlikely that he himself ever gave serious personal consideration to an argument like the Wager. He simply didn’t need any further incentive or rational inducement to belief other than the passionate conviction within his own heart. On the other hand, it’s not unlikely that he thought the Wager might appeal to and perhaps even sway a libertine, a skeptic, or a Deist who might be teetering on the brink of belief. And that goes even more for a figure like a Méré or Mitton or any of the other young gallants and connoisseurs of honnêteté whom Pascal came to know in the salons and gaming rooms of Paris. After all, what better than a wager to entice a gambler? “Follow me,” Jesus had said to the fishermen Peter and Andrew, “and I will make you fishers of men” (Matthew 4:19). Similarly, Pascal, in the role a latter-day apostle, uses a game of chance as a net to bring sinners to salvation.

The concept of the Wager was by no means original with Pascal. Versions of it can be found as far back as Euripides’ The Bacchae. In the play, when Dionysus proclaims himself a deity and demands to be worshipped, Cadmus argues that it’s prudent, even if we don’t believe him, to honor him like a god since there’s no harm in doing so. (On the other hand, we risk a great deal of personal hardship by failing to show him proper reverence if he truly is a god.)

Sir Thomas More’s anecdote of the Gallant and the Friar presents in an inverted form a similar conflict and moral: When a gallant sees a friar walking barefoot in the snow, he asks him why he endures such pain. The friar responds that the pain is trivial, if we remember Hell. “But what if there is no hell?” inquires the amused gallant, adding “then art thou a great fool.” “Yes, master,” the friar replies, “but what if there is a hell? Then art thou a greater fool.”

A comical modern parody of the Wager occurs in the 1951 Broadway musical Guys and Dolls. Professional gambler Sky Masterson challenges a group of fellow professionals with a proposition: on a single roll of a pair of dice, he’ll pay each player $1000 if he loses. But if he wins, the gamblers will have to attend a midnight revival meeting at the Save-a-Soul mission. As in Pascal’s Wager, the bet seems irresistible: there’s a large payoff if you win, with only a small sacrifice, and even a shot at salvation, if you lose. Sky wins his wager. The gamblers are “saved.”

Voltaire called the Wager “indecent and childish” and thought it strange that Pascal reduced questions of the highest gravity to the mathematics of games of chance. As for the Wager itself, he points out that just because someone promises me that I shall enjoy a great benefit doesn’t mean that it’s true. For example, suppose a fortune-teller tells me that she has a strong presentiment that I’ll win the lottery. Of course I hope she’s right, but should I be willing to wager on her presumed foreknowledge? If so, how much? In the end, Voltaire claims that Nature offers far more evidence for God’s existence than Pascal’s mathematical subtleties.

Following up on Voltaire’s objections, Diderot pointed out that Pascal’s same basic argument (better to believe than not to believe) would apply equally well to any other religion: “An imam could argue just as well this way.” Indeed, by this logic, it could be argued that the more fanatical the religion, and the more extreme its promised rewards for belief and punishments for non-belief, the more powerful the argument in its favor.

Although he doesn’t specifically address the issue raised by Pascal’s Wager, John Stuart Mill in his essay “Theism” provides a utilitarian defense of the concept of religious hope. In effect, he argues that in a case where the truth is uncertain and the alternatives, immortality of the soul vs. extinction; existence of God vs. His non-existence, appear equally probable, it is legitimate to prefer the more hopeful option as being the choice more likely conducive to overall happiness.

In his essay “The Will to Believe” William James offers a sharp critical assessment of the Wager and finds Pascal’s basic argument to be weak, sophistic, and insincere:

. . . When religious faith expresses itself thus, in the language of the gaming-table, it is put to its last trumps. Surely Pascal's own personal belief in masses and holy water had far other springs; and this celebrated page of his is but an argument for others, a last desperate snatch at a weapon against the hardness of the unbelieving heart. We feel that a faith in masses and holy water adopted willfully after such a mechanical calculation would lack the inner soul of faith's reality; and if we were ourselves in the place of the Deity, we should probably take particular pleasure in cutting off believers of this pattern from their infinite reward (224).

However, having said this, James goes on to makes a pragmatic case for voluntary belief similar to Mill’s utilitarian defense of “hope” and to some extent comparable to Kierkegaard’s “leap of faith”. He argues that there are matters where the truth is in doubt and science is incapable of passing judgment as in the question of whether God exists. Where that choice is, in his terms, live (meaning that it seems of vital interest and value to us and engages us emotionally), momentous (meaning that it is non-trivial and has serious consequences), and forced (meaning that we must choose one way or the other and cannot simply sit the fence or stand aside), then it is lawful, indeed even necessary for us to weigh the risks and evidence and choose. In the end, James basically recasts Pascal’s Wager in a new form, re-focusing on its existential and psychological dimensions and dispensing with what he regards as its stagy and cheapening gambling metaphors.

c. Minor Works (Opuscules)

Besides his two major works (the Pensées and the Provinciales), Pascal also wrote several shorter works touching on a wide range of topics – from political legitimacy and social order to Stoicism and romantic love. A brief overview and précis of some of the better known and more important of these minor works follows.

i. Writings on Grace

Essentially an extensive commentary on human nature and the doctrine of divine grace, the Écrits represent Pascal’s most ambitious venture into the arena of Catholic theological debate. First published in 1779, the work was written at the same time as the provinciales and covers much of the same ground (proximate power, concupiscence, free will, and so forth), though in a more serious and less cavalier manner and in a more direct and methodical form.  Along with other deep matters, Pascal here explicates Augustine’s distinction between human nature in its unfallen state as pure, innocent, and naturally just, though capable of choice and error, and our postlapsarian condition, which is in thrall to concupiscence and naturally prone, indeed practically bound to do evil if it were not for God’s prevenient grace.  Adam was upright but free to fall; we children of Adam are weighed down by sin, and incapable of rising by our own effort. But, we are free to accept grace and can therefore be lifted up.

Pascal dissects the problem of free will in a similarly Augustinian fashion. Adam had free will in the sense that he could freely choose either good or evil, though he naturally inclined to the former. We, in our concupiscent state, are also free to choose. However, we are naturally inclined to prefer evil, which in our ignorant, fallen condition we commonly mistake for good. Pascal also points out that through the grace of Jesus Christ, a grace instilled by the Holy Spirit, we can achieve a redeemed will – a will sufficient to overcome concupiscence and capable of recognizing and choosing good.

Commentators on the Écrits have questioned whether its depiction of grace (which is presented as something largely mysterious yet vital for salvation) is consistent with the rational apologetic approach and systematic style of argument that Pascal sought to use in the Pensées.

ii. On the Geometric Spirit

Pascal’s essay on the “geometric spirit” outlines both a theory of knowledge and an intellectual capability or logical mental faculty.  He asserts that geometry and mathematics are the only areas of human inquiry that provide knowledge that is both certain and infallible. He then supports this claim with arguments and demonstrations. He goes on to describe a certain quality or faculty of mind that he calls l’esprit géométrique, which he defines as the ability to take known or perceived truths and to present them in such a way – with such precise steps, perfect elegance, and logical rigor – that their truth cannot help but be recognized and approved by others. Such an irrefutable and triumphant persuasiveness – the ability to vanquish all doubt and counter-argument – seems to have been Pascal’s goal in all his writings, whether on scientific subjects or in matters of theological dispute. In any case, the “geometric spirit” is both a prominent characteristic of Pascal’s own genius as well as an important epistemological idea (illustrating both the powers and limitations of the human mind) that he returns to repeatedly throughout his writings.

iii. Discourse on the Passions of Love

Pascal’s authorship of the “Discourse on the Passions of Love” has been disputed for the obvious reason that its subject (romantic love) and sentiments (that love exalts the soul, that those with the greatest souls make the truest lovers, that secret or undeclared love entails both exquisite joy and agonizing pain, and so forth) are highly uncharacteristic of the writer and would seem to be far outside his range of interest and expertise. Yet the style of the Discourse is distinctively Pascalian and some of the ideas contained in it (such as the distinction between the “geometric” mind and the spirit of “finesse”) are certifiably his own. Thus his authorship, while dubious, is at least possible, and so the question for his critics and biographers becomes: how to account for a work that seems so utterly contrary to Pascal’s own modest habits and reputation, so much more in the spirit of the salons of Paris rather than the cells of Port-Royal?

The most popular way of dealing with the Discourse has been simply to dismiss it as uncanonical and regard it as, at bottom, some kind of anonymously composed pastiche that incorporates bits and echoes of Pascal along with selections from other sources. Alternatively, it could be argued that the Discourse is written in the style and spirit of the Paris salons because Pascal himself intentionally wrote it in that vein, possibly as a kind of literary exercise or demonstration on his part for the amusement of his friends Méré and Mitton and their circle. (One can indeed easily imagine the pair challenging their shy friend to attempt such an exercise and then delighting in his successful performance.) So even though the Discourse may indeed be Pascal’s, its content and sentiments are for the most part artificial and insincere, many of the expressed opinions being mere restatements or variations of age-old commonplaces and platitudes about romantic love taken either from the précieuse poetry of his own era or from earlier literature.  (See, for example, the medieval Rules of Courtly Love of Andreas Capellanus, a compendium of witty, lofty, acerbic, or tongue-in-cheek observations about love very similar to Pascal’s.)

iv. Discourses on the Condition of the Great

Despite its minor status, the “Discourses on the Great” is nevertheless of interest since it is the only work of Pascal’s that attempts to formulate something like a social or political philosophy. The work (which is addressed to a young man of high degree) begins with a parable about a castaway on an island whom the inhabitants (owing to his close physical resemblance) mistake for their long-lost king. Such, Pascal argues, is the condition of those born to nobility or wealth within society: it is only by coincidence or lucky accident and by the power of custom and convention, not by nature, that they have their status. From this it follows that persons of rank are obligated to conduct themselves with due humility and must never allow themselves to treat those on society’s lower rungs with insolence or disrespect. Pascal concludes the Discourses by reminding his young learner of his true condition and enjoins him to rule and lead with beneficence.

Simply stated, the political philosophy expressed in the Discourses is noblesse oblige. Pascal acknowledges that the origins of human inequality are of two kinds, natural and institutional. The former arise from relative abilities or deficiencies of mind or body. For instance, A has better eyesight than B; X is taller and stronger than Y).Institutional inequalities, unless they are sanctioned by divine law, are entirely conventional and sometimes even arbitrary and can be rescinded or overturned. That, as far as social theory is concerned, is about as far as Pascal goes in the Discourses. Since his primary purpose is to offer moral instruction to a young nobleman, he doesn’t address topics like property, the social contract, divine right theory, which was a view recently and avidly affirmed by Louis XIV, or the ethics of revolt. From scattered comments in the Pensées, we know that he was politically conservative and despised violence. Apparently his experience during the Fronde led him to believe that even oppressive order is better than anarchy and that there is no worse social evil than civil war (see Pensées 94/128, 81/116, 85/119).

v. Prayer on the Proper Use of Sickness

Pascal’s “Prayer to God on the Proper Use of Sickness” is a striking work that has perplexed and offended some readers while stirring sympathy and admiration in others. Readers of the first sort, knowing of Pascal’s persistent illnesses and chronic pain, are disturbed to find him here not only begging forgiveness for the few pleasures he enjoyed during his brief intervals of health, but even thanking God for his lifetime of afflictions and earnestly beseeching Him for more of the same. These readers view the “Prayer” as an expression of almost pathological morbidity and the testament of a fanatic. Interpreted in this way, Pascal’s portrayal of the pleasures of life as cruel and deadly and of disease and affliction as salutary and healing seem not so much holy paradoxes as evidence of the extent to which the gloom of Jansenism had darkened his entire outlook.

This reading is defective in at least two ways. First, it ignores the fact that the paradoxes invoked in the “Prayer”—life is death; death is life; health is illness, illness is health; pain is pleasure, pleasure is pain; and so forth — are Christian commonplaces and that the rhetorical use of such figures had long been a standard feature of Christian discourse. (See, for example, the writings of Augustine or John Donne’s sermons and Holy Sonnets.) Second, any accusation of exaggerated melodrama or overstatement in the “Prayer” also overlooks the degree to which serious illness and devastating rates of mortality – plagues, deaths, executions, amputations – were an everyday part of life in Europe during the 17th century. Viewed in this context, the “Prayer” may still strike modern readers as unnaturally bleak, but it expresses sentiments and feelings that many of Pascal’s contemporaries would have been familiar with and shared.

The “Prayer” can be more accurately characterized as a simple statement of faith and humility and a plea for patience and courage. It expresses the blend of neo-stoicism and contemptus mundi that was common in prayers and sermons of the day. Christian stoicism had been recently introduced into French literature via the writings of Guillaume du Vair, and Pascal had likely read Epictetus’s Enchiridion in du Vair’s translation. Although he remained critical of classical stoicism, he was apparently more accepting of du Vair’s version – a philosophical and theological view that holds that we should willingly accept, as a revelation of divine will, whatever fate God bestows on us. Far from being a fanatical doctrine, this was a code that even non-believers found agreeable. Indeed most of us find it admirable when individuals who are sorely afflicted with a disease or who have suffered the loss of an organ or limb accept their condition with fortitude and equanimity.

vi. Pascal’s Conversation with M. de Saci on Epictetus and Montaigne

The minor work Entretien avec M.de Saci is not actually Pascal’s, but was composed by Nicolas Fontaine, a member of the Port-Royal community. It is the record of a conversation that took place between Pascal and his spiritual director Lemaistre de Sacy shortly after Pascal took up residence at Port-Royal in 1654. The work wasn’t published until 1736, but it’s an important document nevertheless since it represents the fullest discussion that we have of Pascal’s views on Western philosophy. The portrait of Pascal that emerges from the Conversation is well drawn and seems authentic, and the words and style are recognizably his own. Many of the ideas presented in the work can be found scattered throughout the Pensées, where they are expressed in nearly similar language and where once again Epictetus and Montaigne stand as mighty opposites: the former championing but over-estimating the greatness and nobility of humankind, the latter recognizing but exaggerating our folly and ignorance.

Pascal praises Epictetus as a brilliant philosopher whose knowledge of our essential moral duties and especially of our need for patience, courage, faith, and humility is unsurpassed. Unfortunately, the philosopher’s “diabolic pride” leads him astray. For example, Epictetus wrongly supposes that human reason is a perfectly reliable guide to truth. He also errs in holding that the mind and the senses are sufficient for perceiving and understanding the true nature and overall justice of the cosmos.

Of Montaigne, Pascal remarks that although he was a professed Catholic he nevertheless chose to forego Christian doctrine as a source of moral law and turned instead to his, admittedly fallible, personal judgment and natural instinct as ethical guides. Pascal then goes on to criticize Montaigne for his utter and thoroughgoing Pyrrhonism symbolized by the device of a scales that Montaigne had emblazoned on the ceiling of his study with his famous motto Que sais-je?(What do I know?) inscribed beneath. Pascal argues that, in contrast to Epictetus, Montaigne’s error consists not in glorifying or over-estimating human reason and knowledge but rather in denying them any credit or status whatsoever. Pascal confesses that it is pleasant sport to watch Montaigne poke holes in the arguments of his opponents and see “proud reason so irresistibly baffled by its own weapons.” Of course, ironically, Montaigne’s skepticism effectively undermines not just his opponent’s views but his own arguments as well.

Near the end of the conversation, Pascal launches into an oratorical peroration describing how the errors, imperfections, and opposing polarities represented by the two philosophers are ultimately mediated and reconciled in the person of Jesus Christ. @

It is therefore from this imperfect enlightenment that it happens that the one [that is, Epictetus] knowing the duties of man and being ignorant of his impotence, is lost in presumption, and that the other [that is, Montaigne], knowing the impotence and being ignorant of the duty, falls into laxity; whence it seems that since the one leads to truth, the other to error, there would be formed from their alliance a perfect system of morals. But instead of this peace, nothing but war and a general ruin would result from their union; for the one establishing certainty, the other doubt, the one the greatness of man, the other his weakness, they would destroy the truths as well as the falsehoods of each other. So that they cannot subsist alone because of their defects, nor unite because of their opposition, and thus they break and destroy each other to give place to the truth of the Gospel. This it is that harmonizes the contrarieties by a wholly divine act, and uniting all that is true and expelling all that is false, thus makes of them a truly celestial wisdom in which those opposites accord that were incompatible in human doctrines. . . . Such is the marvelous and novel union which God alone could teach, and which He alone could make, and which is only a type and an effect of the ineffable union of two natures in the single person of a Man-God.

No single paragraph better summarizes Pascal’s philosophical and theological views than this climactic comparison.

3. Mathematical and Scientific Works

a. Conic Sections

Pascal made his first important mathematical discovery and published his first article, the Essay on Conics (1640), at the age of sixteen. Barely an essay at all, the work is a one-page document consisting of three diagrams, three definitions, and two lemmas. Although it had little immediate impact beyond a small circle of mathematicians, it was nevertheless a breakthrough contribution to the emerging new field of projective geometry. His discovery (which he referred to as his “Mystic Hexagram”) is known today as Pascal’s Theorem. It states that if six points are situated on a conic section (an ellipse, parabola, or hyperbola), and if these points are then joined by line segments to form a hexagon, then if the sides of this hexagon are projected beyond the section, the pairs of opposite sides will meet in three points all of which lie on a straight line.

Fig. 1

Figure 1: Pascal's "Mystic Hexagram." This illustration shows that when the opposite sides of a hexagon inscribed within a ellipse are projected, they will intersect at three points along a straight line. (In this case all the points lie entirely outside the ellipse.)

After his death, Pascal’s unpublished mathematical papers (including what seems to have been a full treatise on conics) were collected by his nephew Étienne Périer. Eventually these manuscripts were turned over to the great German philosopher and mathematician Gottfried Leibniz for his evaluation and use. Leibniz left behind an extensive set of notes on the collection and registered his admiration for Pascal’s genius. Unfortunately Pascal’s original papers have all been lost.

b. Experiments on the Vacuum

In 1644 the Italian physicist Evangelista Torricelli, testing a hypothesis suggested by Galileo, took a glass tube closed at one end and filled it with mercury. He then inverted the tube, open end down, into a bowl also containing mercury and watched as the mercury in the tube dropped slightly leaving a vacant space at the top. Contrary to the prevailing scientific view upheld by Aristotelians and Cartesians alike according to which a vacuum in nature is a physical impossibility, Torricelli surmised that the space at the top of the tube was indeed a vacuum and that it was created by the pressure of the external air, which exactly balanced the pressure exerted by the column of mercury inside the tube.

Pascal learned of the experiment from his former mentor Père Mersenne. Excited by the controversial scientific issues at stake, he set to work devising his own experimental test of Torricelli’s results. Just obtaining the required apparatus posed a huge challenge. Scientists of the era typically had to design, specify, oversee the production of, test, and of course pay for their own equipment. Pascal did all that and then went to work conducting his own experiments and demonstrations. Confident of his results, he went on tour to demonstrate his hypothesis, which he was able to do using tubes of different length and diameter and a variety of liquids. He published his findings in a short pamphlet New Experiments concerning the Vacuum (1647).

The decisive experiment, proving that the level of mercury in the tube was due to external air pressure, was conducted at the Puy-de-Dôme, the mountainous lava dome near Pascal’s native Clermont. Pascal designed and organized the experiment, but because of his health issues it was actually conducted by his brother-in-law Florin Périer along with a team of observers, clerics, and local officials. Using two identical tubes, the team measured the levels of mercury at a base point in the town. Then, with a portion of the party staying behind to monitor the mercury level in one tube, which remained at the home base, Florin and the rest of the party ascended the mountain with the other tube and measured the mercury level at various elevations. It was found that the level of mercury in the mobile (or test) tube varied inversely with the altitude. Meanwhile, the mercury level in the stationary (or control) tube never varied. Repeated experiments produced the same conclusive results: the level of mercury was due to air pressure, which also has the ability to create a vacuum.

Pascal published a record of the experiment in a short document entitled “The Account of the Great Experiment of the Equilibrium of Fluids.” to which he appended a closing note that deserves quotation since it marks a historic turning point in the advance of modern science vis-à-vis ancient authority. On the basis of his experiments, he asserts “that nature has no repugnance for the vacuum” and “makes no effort to avoid it”:

. . . all the effects that have been attributed to her horror have their origin in the weight and pressure of the air, that it is their sole and true cause. . . . It is not on this occasion only that, when the weakness of men has been unable to find the true causes, their subtlety has substituted imaginary causes to which they have given specious names filling the ears and not the mind. Thus it is said that the sympathy and antipathy of natural bodies are efficient causes, responsible for many effects, as if inanimate bodies were capable of sympathy and antipathy; it is the same with antiperistasis and with many other chimerical causes, which but give a vain solace to man’s hunger to know hidden truths, and which, far from revealing them, serve only to cover up the ignorance of such inventors and to feed that of their followers.

One other document relating to the vacuum that dates from this period (October 29, 1647) and which bears special mention is Pascal’s reply to (the felicitously if improbably named) Père Noël. A Jesuit priest who embraced the widely accepted doctrine (approved by both Aristotelian and Cartesian physicists) that nature is a material plenum and will not permit a vacuum, Noël had written a letter to Pascal defending the horror vacui viewpoint and arguing that the empty space that Pascal claims to have observed at the top of the tubes in his experiments was not empty space at all but a space necessarily filled with “rarified air” or some other subtle form of substance. Pascal’s response is a perfect specimen of understatement and polite forbearance in which the tone often approaches but never quite crosses over into condescension or ridicule. The provinciales are usually cited as the original instance of classic French prose style, but the letter to Noël and indeed a number of Pascal’s scientific papers – all notable for their force, clarity, concision, and elegance as well as for their utter absence of bombast, fustian, and needless adornment – could also lay claim to setting the model. An early paragraph in Pascal’s letter succinctly defines his criteria and standards of truth in matters of scientific investigation; two later paragraphs illustrate his tactful but forceful way of dealing with the kind of learned ignorance that Sir Francis Bacon had referred to as “vain imaginations” and the “idols of the theatre”:

The rule [of scientific method] is never to make a decisive judgment, affirming or denying a proposition, unless what one affirms or denies satisfies one of the two following conditions: either that of itself it appear so clearly and distinctly to sense or to reason, according as it is subject to one or the other, that the mind cannot doubt its certainty, and this is what we call a principle or axiom, as, for example, if equals are added to equals, the results are equal; or that it be deduced as an infallible and necessary consequence from such principles or axioms . . . . Everything satisfying one of these conditions is certain and true, and everything satisfying neither is considered doubtful and uncertain.  We pass decisive judgment on things of the first kind and leave the rest undecided, calling them, according to their deserts, now a vision, now a caprice, occasionally a fancy, sometimes an idea, and at the most a happy thought; and since it is rash to affirm them, we incline rather to the negative, ready however to return to the affirmative if a convincing demonstration brings their truth to light….

For all things of this kind [that is, hypothetical entities] whose existence is not manifest to sense are as hard to believe as they are easy to invent. Many persons, even among the most learned men of the day, have opposed me with this same substance [that is, rarified air or some comparable ethereal matter] before you (but simply as an idea and not as a certain truth), and that is why I mentioned it among my propositions. Others, to fill empty space with some kind of matter, have imagined one with which they have filled the entire universe, because imagination has this peculiarity that it produces the greatest things with as little time and trouble as little things; some have considered this matter as of the same substance as the sky and the elements, and others of a different substance, as their fancy dictated, for they disposed of it as of their own work.

But if we ask of them, as of you, that you show us this matter, they answer that it cannot be seen; if we ask that it make a sound, they say it cannot be heard, and so with all the remaining senses; and they think they have done much when they have convicted others of powerlessness to show that it does not exist by depriving themselves of all power to show that it does.

Pascal later composed, but never published, two detailed monographs that were discovered among his manuscripts after his death: a Treatise on the Equilibrium of Liquids and a Treatise on the Weight of the Mass of Air. These two treatises represent seminal contributions to the sciences of hydraulics and hydrostatics and include the discovery that if no other forces are acting on a fluid, the pressure will be the same throughout the fluid and the same in all directions – an observation that is known today as Pascal’s Principle. It is in recognition of his important work in the study of fluid mechanics that a standard unit of pressure is today known as the pascal (Pa), defined as a force equal to 1 Newton per square meter.

c. Pascal’s Triangle and Probability Theory

In 1654, Pascal responded to a series of problems posed by his friend Antoine Gombaud, the self-styled Chevalier de Méré, an amateur mathematician and noted gambler. Suppose, Pascal was asked, that you are given 24 rolls of a pair of dice. What is the probability of your throwing double sixes at least one time? Méré also asked a related question known as the “problem of the points” (also known as the problem of the division of the stakes). This problem asks, if a wager game is terminated before it has been completed, how should the contestants divide the stakes? For example, suppose that A and B are playing a winner-take-all game in which a point is scored on every try and the winner is the first player to reach ten points. How should the stakes be divided if the game is terminated after A has 7 points and B has 5?

Pascal developed solutions to these and other problems relating to the calculation of gambling odds and in an exchange of letters shared his insights with the great Toulouse mathematician Pierre de Fermat. Together the two correspondents effectively founded the modern theory of probability.

Part of the foundation for the modern theory is provided in Pascal’s “Treatise on the Arithmetical Triangle,” which he composed in 1653. (He sent a copy of this document to Fermat during their correspondence, but it was never published until after his death.) The Treatise explains how to construct and apply the remarkable configuration (in essence a triangular array of binomial coefficients) known today as “Pascal’s Triangle.” The array had been generated and used previously by Chinese, Indian, Persian, and European mathematicians, and Pascal never claimed to have discovered or originated it. He was simply interested in demonstrating its fascinating properties and powers.

Pascal triangle Figure 2. Pascal's Triangle.

Pascal calls the square containing each number in the array a cell. The numeral 1’s at the top of his triangle head perpendicular rows; those on the left side of the triangle head parallel rows. He calls the third (diagonal) side of the triangle the base. Cells along any diagonal row are called cells of the same base. The first diagonal row (consisting of the number 1) is row 0. The second diagonal row (1, 1) is row 1; and so on. The number value of each cell is equal to the sum of its immediately preceding perpendicular and parallel cells. For example, 120 in the base diagonal (item 4 in row 7) = 36 + 84.

Furthermore, the number value of each cell is also equal to the sum of all the cells of the preceding row (from the first cell to the cell immediately above the target cell). For example, 126 (the number value of cell 6 in row 5) = 1 + 4 + 10 + 20 + 35 + 56 (the sum of cells 1-6 of row 4).

Pascal explains in detail how the Triangle can be used to calculate combinations (that is to compute C in cases where nCr = n things taken r at a time). As Pascal demonstrates, to find the answer we would move perpendicularly down to the nth row and then move diagonally r cells. For example, for 5C4, we would go perpendicularly down to row 5 and then move diagonally 4 cells and find that the number of combinations is 5. Similarly, if we calculate for 6C3,we would move down 6 rows and then diagonally 3 cells and find that the answer is 20. And so on. In another section of the Treatise, Pascal explains how to use the Triangle to solve the Problem of Points.

Solutions to Méré’s problems:

1. Probability of at least one double-six in 24 rolls of two dice: 1 - (35/36)24 = 0.4914.

2. Problem of points: A needs 3 more points, B needs 5 more points. (Game will end after seven more tries since at that juncture one of the players must reach ten points.) Count 3 + 5 rows on the Triangle; then sum the first 5 items. That sum divided by the sum of all items in the row is A’s portion of the stakes. Then sum the remaining 3 items in the row and divide that total by the sum of all the items in the row. That will be B’s portion.

From the Triangle:

(1+7+21+35+35) ÷ (1+7+21+35+35+21+7+1) = 99/128 = A’s portion.

(1+7+21) ÷ (1+7+21+35+35+21+7+1) = 29/128 = B’s portion.

Expressed as a percentage, A receives 77.34375 percent of the stake; B receives 22.65625 percent of the stake.

d. Infinity

The idea of mathematical infinity – of a number that can be vaguely conceived but whose properties and nature can never be fully understood – has strong affinities with Pascal’s idea of God and also relates to his Wager and to his personal anxiety as he contemplates the “eternal silence of these infinite spaces” (201/233).

Imagine Pascal’s Triangle. Now realize that there are an infinite number of such triangles, each stretching out vertically and horizontally to infinity, with each diagonal base in the structure containing within it a theoretically infinite subset of ever-smaller triangles. Such is the paradoxical notion of infinity, a concept that astounded and haunted Pascal, and which has teased, baffled, and intrigued a long list of theorists and commentators from Nicholas of Cusa and Giordano Bruno to Bertrand Russell and David Foster Wallace. Although the idea of infinity can fill the imagination with dread, it can also, as Pascal points out at the conclusion of his treatise Of the Geometrical Spirit, provide us with a true understanding of nature and of our place in it:

But those who clearly perceive these truths will be able to admire the grandeur and power of nature in this double infinity that surrounds us on all sides, and to learn by this marvelous consideration to know themselves, in regarding themselves thus placed between an infinitude and a negation of extension, between an infinitude and a negation of number, between an infinitude and a negation of movement, between an infinitude and a negation of time. From which we may learn to estimate ourselves at our true value, and to form reflections which will be worth more than all the rest of geometry itself.

e. Solving the Cycloid

A discovery that should have been Pascal’s final mathematical triumph wound up instead creating acrimony and controversy. In the spring of 1658, supposedly as a diversion while contending with a toothache, he took up the problem of the roulette or cycloid, a problem that had puzzled some of Europe’s best mathematicians, including Galileo and Descartes, for nearly a century.

Pascal Fig. 3

Figure 3: Cycloid

Imagine a point P on the circumference of a revolving circle. A cycloid is the curve described by P as it rolls along a straight line.  The challenge is to discover and prove the area of this curve geometrically. Pascal worked out his own solution and then, as was common practice at the time, issued a public challenge to fellow mathematicians. Under the name Amos Dettonville, an anagram of the pseudonym Louis de Montalte, which he had used to write the provinciales (an anagram of the motto Talentum Deo Soli – “My talent for God alone”—according to Morris Bishop), Pascal drew up a list of six problems relating to the cycloid and offered a prize of 600 livres to the first person to solve them (Bishop 222). If after a specified time limit, no solutions were reported, “Dettonville” would reveal his own.

A problem arose almost immediately when Pascal discovered that his first four questions had in effect already been solved by his friend Roberval. The contest was therefore reduced to the final two questions, a change that, unfortunately, was not made clear to all the contestants. In addition, some contestants protested that the time limit was unreasonably short. Christian Huygens and Christopher Wren published solutions, but did not compete for the prize. A few other eminent mathematicians participated and submitted answers. However, Pascal, finding none of the submissions fully satisfactory, eventually revealed his own solutions and declared himself the winner. Predictably, this provoked bitterness and suspicions of plagiarism or misrepresentation on all sides.

Though the controversy left a blemish on Pascal’s reputation, his work on the cycloid has been admired by later mathematicians for its ingenuity and elegance, and he is credited, alongside his great contemporaries Galileo, Torricelli, Descartes, Mersenne, Roberval, Fermat, Wren, and Huygens, as having helped to solve the curve once known for its power to attract and captivate all who studied it as the “Helen of geometers.” In 1672, after having obtained and reviewed copies of Pascal’s papers on conics and the cycloid, Leibniz attested to their brilliance and concluded that were it not for an “evil fate” (by which phrase it’s unclear whether he meant their author’s short lifespan or his absorption in Jansenist theology) Pascal would have almost certainly gone on to make further and deeper mathematical discoveries.

Summarizing Pascal’s scientific and mathematical achievements, it can be said that in an age of amateurism, when everyone from priests and attorneys to soldiers and salonnières dabbled in “natural philosophy,” he was a marvel who often found himself in a position analogous to that later experienced by Newton and Leibniz: that is, he had to communicate dramatically new, highly complex and abstract concepts to readers who lacked his extraordinary mathematical imagination and facility. Having made his discoveries more or less instinctively, using his own private mathematical inventions and methods, he then found he had to “translate” his ideas into the conventionally accepted language and procedures of his peers and fellow numerophiles. Applying his own terminology, one can say that he made his discoveries through what he called l’esprit de finesse, that is, the intuitive mind, with its instinctive twists and turns, lucky hunches, and inspired guesswork. He found, however, that in order to communicate his findings to others he had to turn to what he styled l’esprit géométrique that is, the geometric mind, which he defined as the skill or capacity for “demonstrating truths already found, and of elucidating them in such a manner that the proof of them shall be irresistible”. Excellence in science and mathematics, he argued, requires both capabilities. It was Pascal’s good fortune to possess both l’esprit de finesse and l’esprit géométrique in rare and powerful abundance.

4. Philosophy of Science and Theory of Knowledge

a. Philosophy of Science

Of the many great natural philosophers of the 17th century  – a group that includes both theoreticians and experimentalists and such illustrious names as Galileo, Descartes, Bacon, Boyle, Huygens, and Gassendi – Pascal arguably was the one who came closest to articulating a coherent, comprehensive, durable philosophy of science consistent with and comparable to the standard view that prevails today, except that he came up short. As Desmond M. Clarke has argued, Pascal was torn between his love of geometric proof and pure logical demonstration on the one hand and his skeptical, pragmatic instincts in favor of down-to-earth experimentalism and empiricism on the other. As a result he seemed trapped in a kind of philosophical limbo. (See “Pascal’s Philosophy of Science,” in Hammond, 118.) Similarly, although he seemed to recognize that our knowledge of the natural world is only probable and can never be certain, a part of him nevertheless remained enthralled by the “will-o-the-wisp” or “Holy Grail” of absolute certainty.

In most other respects, Pascal’s outlook is ahead of its time and admirable in its self-restraint and in its awareness of its own limitations. Unlike Bacon, he makes room for hypothesis and even imaginative insight and conjecture (l’esprit de finesse) and also allows a deductive component a la Descartes (l’esprit géométrique). He acknowledges that all hypotheses must be tested and confirmed by rigorous experiments, and even if he didn’t actually carry out his experiments exactly as described, he nevertheless accepts the necessity of such testing. Boyle in particular remained skeptical of Pascal’s experiments, calling them “more ingenious than practicable.” He especially marveled at the availability of 40-ft. Torricelli tubes and of brass fittings engineered to nearly microscopic precision. Attempting to reproduce one of Pascal’s hydrostatic tests involving a fly in a chamber of water, Boyle attests that “upon tryal with a strong flie” the creature “presently drowned” (243.)

Pascal fully understood that once a hypothesis is tested and confirmed, the problem of determining the true cause of the phenomenon still remains and becomes itself a matter for further conjecture. For example, take his prediction, experimentally confirmed, that the level of mercury in a Torricelli tube will decline as altitude increases. Pascal claimed that this phenomenon was due to the weight of air, though he knew that other factors might also explain the same effect. Indeed, for all he knew, an invisible emanation from the god Mercury may have influenced his results. (Ironically, the famous Puy-de-Dôme experiment had been performed near an ancient temple to that deity). As Pascal observed to Father Noël, fanciful explanations for phenomena are as easy to imagine as they are impossible to disprove.

In his correspondence with Noël, Pascal at one point suggests that it is fatal for one’s hypothesis if an experimental test fails to confirm a predicted outcome. However, as he himself and his fellow experimentalists certainly knew, there can be nearly as many reasons why an expected result does not occur, such as defective apparatus, lack of proper controls, measurement errors, extraordinary test circumstances, etc, as there are explanations for a result that occurs as expected. Apparently in his haste to champion the new science of experimentalism against its critics, both Cartesian and Scholastic, Pascal wanted to at least be able to say that if experiments cannot conclusively prove a given hypothesis, then they may at least be able to disprove it. If this was his intention, he was anticipating by nearly three centuries Karl Popper’s theory of empirical falsification and opposed to (and seemingly fearful at the prospect of) any view similar to WVO Quine’s theory of confirmation holism, according to which all scientific claims are at best only probable and there is no such thing as a decisive experiment.

b. Theory of Knowledge

Que-sais-je? (“What do I know?”) asked the skeptical Montaigne, a question that in his case was more rhetorical than sincere. Que puis-je savoir? (“What can I know?”) was Pascal’s more earnest if also slightly skeptical variation. Anticipating Kant, he wondered with what limitations and with what level of assurance we can confidently say we know what we believe we know.

Pascal has been plausibly labeled an empiricist, a foundationalist, even a positivist and a skeptic. The confusion is understandable and is due largely to the fact that his epistemological views are complex and seem in certain respects equivocal or inconsistent. For example, he accepts the rule of authority in some areas of knowledge, such as ancient history, while opposing and even forbidding it in others, especially physical science. He also recognizes three different types or sources of knowledge related to his so-called “three orders”: body/sense; mind/reason; heart/will or instinct, each with its own domain or area of applicability, level of certainty, and tests of confirmation and reliability.

i. Reason and Sense

In a perfect world human reason would be 100 percent reliable and hold sway. Presumably, Adam, prior to the Fall, had such a pristine and certain view of things, such that there was a perfect congruency or correspondence between his inner perceptions and the outer world. Pascal believes that the axioms and first principles of math, geometry, and logic constitute knowledge of this kind. They are perceived directly by reason and (along with any consequences that we can directly deduce from them) represent the only knowledge that we can know infallibly and with certainty. It is with respect to such axioms and principles alone that Pascal accepts Descartes’ criteria of clearness and distinctness as reliable evidence of truth. Everything else is subject to error and doubt.

A critic of Cartesian rationalism and the deductive method, which he referred to as “useless and uncertain” – 887/445, Pascal was for the most part an empiricist and experimentalist who held that our knowledge of the natural world is acquired through the senses and must be tested and empirically verified by experiment. Reason also has a role in this process. It guides our observations and assists us in the forming of hypotheses and predictions. It is reason that also judges and approves (or disapproves) the final results, though it does so on the basis of empirical evidence, not deductive logic or some preconceived system.

In the Preface to his Treatise on the Vacuum, Pascal declares that reason and sense alone must rule and authority has no place in the establishment of scientific truth. Authority is to be respected, he says, in history, jurisprudence, languages, and above all in matters of theology, where the authority of Scripture and the Fathers is omnipotent. But, he argues that in the case of physical science reverence for the ancients can actually cloud the truth and impede the advancement of knowledge, especially when such reverence is, blind, misplaced, or overly devout. He concludes the Preface with a witty reversal of roles in the heated, ongoing debate between “ancients and moderns”:

Those whom we call ancient were really new in all things, and properly constituted the infancy of mankind; and as we have joined to their knowledge the experience of the centuries which have followed them, it is in ourselves that we should find this antiquity that we revere in others.

ii. The Heart

If there is an element of mystery in Pascal’s theory of knowledge, it is in the source of knowledge and inner being that he terms le Coeur. In scattered places throughout the Pensées he makes reference to a logique du coeur or an ordre du coeur. But what exactly he means by such phrases he never clearly explains. The term coeur appears most famously in fragment 423/680:

The heart has its reasons, which reason does not know. We feel it in a thousand things. I say that the heart naturally loves the Universal Being, and also itself naturally, according as it gives itself to them; and it hardens itself against one or the other at its will. You have rejected the one, and kept the other. Is it by reason that you love yourself?

“The heart has its reasons, which reason doesn’t know.” Not only has Pascal’s famous aphorism become an oft-quoted cliché, it has also managed to enter and even permeate popular culture in the form of song lyrics, as the title of a love memoir, and as a message of endearment or benediction on bumper stickers and greeting cards. Even people who have never read a page of the Pensées are familiar with the quote, and while it seems safe to say that Pascal had no such sentimental meaning in mind, amour, in its various senses from romantic love and self-love to charity and maternal instinct, seems an inescapable association when we hear the phrase “reasons of the heart.” In fact, the Catholic scholar Romano Guardini has plausibly offered “love” and “charity” as appropriate translations or synonyms for coeur (133).

It has also been suggested that by “heart” Pascal means something transcending reason and prior to it (Peters 168-171; Kearns 101-02), almost as if it were some kind of Kantian intuition, or as if it were a form of natural or divinely endowed intelligence on the very cutting edge of perception; some instinctive faculty that, without contradicting reason, can either surpass it or supplement it. (110/142). Such a faculty, if it is indeed instinctive, would presumably be inborn and thus either a part of our basic nature and something that all humans share or a special gift or grace bestowed by God to the elect. And if it is intuitive, then it possibly bears some relation to what Pascal elsewhere terms l’esprit de finesse, the subtle or intuitive component of intellect that somehow “sees” or penetrates directly into truths that l’esprit géométrique,  the logical or sequential intelligence, can arrive at only via incremental, deductive steps. Heart-knowledge would then be like some faint glimmer or trace of the instantaneous, clairvoyant understanding that the unfallen Adam was believed to enjoy in Paradise. In any case, the notion of a raison du Coeur remains a critical crux in Pascal studies and posed a mystery and challenge to his readers.

5. Fideism

Fideism can be defined as the view that religious truth is ascertainable by faith alone and that faith is separate from, superior to, and generally antagonistic towards reason. Whenever the term shows up in a religious or philosophical discussion, it is typically in conjunction with a list that includes names like Tertullian, Luther, Montaigne, Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein, and William James. Pascal’s name is often inserted into this group.

Based on the foregoing definition of fideism, Pascal does not fit into such a list, though the tendency to include him is understandable. Perhaps the most compelling evidence in favor of labeling him a fideist is the striking fact of his midnight conversion and “Night of Fire,” the powerful, visionary experience, clearly more mystical than rational, on the basis of which he wound up explicitly rejecting “the god of the philosophers.” However, just because the medium or process through which a belief is achieved may not be rational, doesn’t mean that the belief itself  is unreasonable. For Pascal, that belief was his acceptance of Jesus Christ as his Lord and Savior. Kekule discovered the shape and structure of the benzene molecule in a dream. Though his means of discovery was non-rational, what he discovered was quite reasonable and proved true.

Another reason why Pascal’s religious views are sometimes confused with fideism is his notion of an infinite and hidden God, who is essentially beyond our comprehension and understanding and whose existence and nature transcends the limited perspectives of reason and sense perception. However, once again, just because God surpasses or eludes empirical sense and reason doesn’t mean that He is contrary to or incompatible with them. “Faith,” Pascal writes, “indeed tells what the senses do not tell, but not the contrary of what they see. It is above them, and not contrary to them” (185/265). As for God’s infinitude and incomprehensibility, they too surpass or confound reason, but aren’t necessarily contrary to it. The notion of mathematical infinity baffles us in the same way. As Pascal points out, just because something is incomprehensible, for example, God, infinity, “a sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere,” doesn’t mean that it can’t exist (149,230/182,262).

Some critics have even used the Wager itself (418/680) as a basis for linking Pascal to fideism since that fragment sets forth and vividly illustrates the view that God’s existence is uncertain and can’t be proved. Of particular significance in this respect is the paragraph in which Pascal, in an observation that seems to echo Tertullian almost as much as St. Paul, candidly acknowledges the “foolishness” of the Christian creed:

Who then will blame Christians for not being able to give reasons for their beliefs, since they profess belief in a religion which they cannot explain? They declare, when they expound it to the world, that it is foolishness, stultitiam; and then you complain because they do not prove it! If they proved it, they would not keep their word; it is through their lack of proofs that they show they are not lacking in sense.

But, again, not being able to prove or give a convincing explanation for a belief is not quite the same thing as saying that the belief is incompatible with or contrary to reason. Conspiracy theories are typically lamely supported and impossible to prove, but they are seldom implausible or illogical. Moreover, it is not just a fideistic claim, but a perfectly orthodox Catholic view (and indeed a widely observable fact) that reason has limits; that it is indeed, as Pascal claims, unreasonable to trust reason too much. “Reason's last step is the recognition that there are an infinite number of things which are beyond it.”  (188/220.)

Pascal eschewed metaphysical proofs of God’s existence not on fideistic grounds because he thought that, as rational constructions, they were contrary to faith, but because he felt they were emotionally sterile and too abstruse and technical to persuade a non-believer:

The metaphysical proofs for the existence of God are so remote from human reasoning and so involved that they make little impact, and, even if they did help some people, it would only be for the moment during which they watched the demonstration, because an hour later they would be afraid they had made a mistake. (190/222)

And this is why I shall not undertake here to prove by reasons from nature either the existence of God, or the Trinity or the immortality of the soul, or anything of that kind: not just because I should not feel competent to find in nature arguments which would convince hardened atheists, but also because such knowledge, without Christ, is useless and sterile. Even if someone were convinced that the proportions between numbers are immaterial, eternal truths, depending on a first truth in which they subsist, called God, I should not consider that he made much progress towards his salvation. The Christian's God does not consist merely of a God who is the author of mathematical truths and the order of the elements. That is the portion of the heathen and Epicureans. (449/690)

In the end, the strongest reason for denying Pascal a place within fideism is that he believed that even the most “irrational” proofs of Christianity – the prophesies, miracles, typological confirmations, and so forth – were not only not contrary to reason but were in fact perfectly compatible with it. (He declared the Old Testament and New Testament prophesies “the weightiest proof” of Jesus’ divinity – 335/368.) That Christianity is reasonable though not provable by reason effectively summarizes one of the central arguments of the entire Pensées.

6. Existentialism

Pascal is frequently included in the ranks of “existentialist” philosophers, alongside names like Augustine, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Sartre.

Again it can be asked (as it was in the case of his alleged affiliation with fideism) whether he belongs in such a list . Once again, the strict, technical response would seem to be that he isn’t an existentialist–although in this case the label is arguably more appropriate and may even be justified.

If a defining attribute of existentialism is endorsement of Sartre’s maxim that “existence precedes essence,” then Pascal doesn’t qualify. For in his view human beings enter the world with a largely defined and determined nature and a destiny that is partly charted, partly free. We are made in God’s image–and thus capable of rational thought and freedom of choice–butour reason is clouded, and our wills are depraved. We are broken creatures and would be hopelessly lost if it were not for divine grace. If such a view of the human condition is incompatible with existentialism, then Pascal is no existentialist.

On the other hand, if Augustine and Kierkegaard (or for that matter any Christian thinker) can be considered existentialists in some broad sense, then it is hard to see why Pascal might not also qualify.  Like Augustine and Kierkegaard, he emphasizes the priority of the individual and the deeply personal character of our choice to believe. Like them, he values and personally exemplifies an extreme inwardness, indeed at times displays an almost fanatical absorption in his mental and spiritual life. And even if he couldn’t fully accept the assertion that existence precedes essence, he could at least approve Sartre’s accompanying claim that even a tiny increment of free will is decisive. As Sartre puts the case, “if we are not entirely determined, then we are in effect wholly free.” Pascal would agree, though he would attribute this freedom to divine grace rather than accepting it as a mere donnée or product of happenstance.

The Confessions, with its focus on the self and personal identity, and especially on the self as a cumulative record, inscribed in memory, of our life-altering decisions and events, is conceivably the first existentialist text. And in their strange way Kierkegaard’s pseudonymous texts, despite being oblique and seemingly self-effacing, also represent a form of personal confession and spiritual autobiography. The Pensées stands as an intermediate text in this series, an experiment in autobiographical apologetics linking the direct, confessional style of Augustine with the multiple personae, lyrical vignettes, and pensive fragments typical of Kierkegaard.

That human life without God is wretched and that the human condition is marked by restlessness, ennui, and anxiety is an observation common to all three writers. Another common feature of their work is the recurrent image of a vast gulf or abyss. Augustine compares the human soul to a deep abyss and likens it to the Nothingness preceding the Creation (Genesis 1:2). Without the light of God, he suggests, we are but a dark emptiness. Kierkegaard argues that human freedom necessarily entails a constant sense of anxiety, and his image of our condition is that of a person standing on the edge of a dark precipice. Pascal’s dread of the silence of infinite space (201/233) and similar images in the Pensées of void and darkness echo these sentiments. And in the background of this imagery also stands the legend of his personal idée fixe – that is, his feeling that he was constantly shadowed by a personal abyss. (This legend relates to the aforementioned story of his accident on the Pont de Neuilly when his coach supposedly almost plunged into the Seine – an unconfirmed but oft-retold event that has been perpetuated and basically permanently enshrined in Baudelaire’s poem “Le Gouffre” and in Freud’s writings on obsession.)

In the Confessions Augustine describes the long ordeal that eventually leads to his conversion. But his narrative doesn’t end at that point. Instead, he must begin a new spiritual test and journey – that of actually living a Christian life. Similarly, Kierkegaard never wrote of being a Christian, but always of becoming one. He regarded an authentic Christian life as a constant trial and task. Like Augustine, Pascal places even harsher spiritual demands on himself after his conversion. And like Kierkegaard, he believes that true Christianity is an ever-striving imitatio Christi, a continual remaking of oneself in the image and spirit of Jesus.

With these resemblances in mind, it’s hardly a stretch to say that entire portions of the Pensées, translated into Latin or Danish, could easily pass for an excerpt from Augustine or from Kierkegaard’s Training in Christianity or another of the author’s “edifying” texts. Similarly, if we place Pascal in a sequence of “Christian existentialist” writers, a line that arguably proceeds from Augustine to Kierkegaard and then on to, say, Unamuno and Berdyaev, we find the same emphasis on personal experience and individual freedom and responsibility; the same rhetorical skill and verbal flourishes; the same flair for metaphor and self-dramatization. In short, if we accept existentialism as not so much a system or body of doctrine, but as more of a perspective or attitude towards life – an exacting and indeed tragic sense of life (depicted graphically and with Dostoyevsky-like force in fragment 434/686) – then Pascal can be considered an existentialist philosopher.

7. Conclusion: Pascal’s Reputation and Cultural Legacy

 “Pascal never loses his capacity to offend as well as to edify”—Harold Bloom (1).

 “How few,” wrote Walter Pater in what was to be his last work, a sparkling critical essay on Pascal, “how select, are the literary figures who have earned the honor of receiving regular ongoing criticism, both appreciative and deprecatory, from their successors.” Pascal has earned that honor and is of that rare and select company, having acquired during the nearly four centuries since his birth a long line of admirers and detractors, including many of the leading names in world literature. Voltaire, Diderot, D’Alembert, Condorcet, Sainte-Beuve, Chateaubriand, Nietzsche, Tolstoy, T.S. Eliot, Borges, Bertrand Russell, Paul Valéry, Harold Bloom – the list of important writers and thinkers who have studied Pascal and gone on to voice their appreciation or discontent could be extended literally for pages.

In his introductory essay to the Pensées published in 1933, Eliot referred to Pascal as “one of those writers who will be and who must be studied afresh by men in every generation. It is not he who changes, but we who change. It is not our knowledge of him that increases, but our world that alters and our attitudes towards it.” (355)

For some reason Eliot assumed that our knowledge of Pascal was basically complete eighty years ago and that modern scholarship would do little to alter or augment our understanding of his life and work. On this point he was quite mistaken. In fact, on the contrary, owing to the biographical and textual labors of scholars like Lafuma, Sellier, and Mesnard, students of Pascal today have a much fuller understanding of the author’s personal life, family, medical history, intellectual and religious development, and social milieu, as well as a far better sense of the likely order, design, and method of the Pensées, than any previous generation of readers.

Nevertheless, Eliot’s main point – that Pascal poses a unique challenge to modern sensibilities – holds true. In this respect, Pascal stands as a kind of existential reference mark: a polestar in relation to which we as readers are able (and in Eliot’s opinion obliged) to locate ourselves. He remains a fixed point against which we are challenged to measure the sincerity and durability of our own values and beliefs.

Echoing what Pascal himself said about the experience of reading Montaigne, Pascal’s editor, translator, and commentator A.J. Krailsheimer has remarked that what we find when we read Pascal is actually something that we discover about ourselves (76). In effect, what both Krailsheimer and Eliot are suggesting is that ultimately there is not one Pascal, but many – possibly as many as there are readers of his texts. For example, Voltaire’s Pascal – the scientific genius and Enlightenment wit turned sour religious fanatic – is the reverse image of the Pascal adored by the Port-Royal community – the gentle saint who abandoned frivolous worldly pursuits to take up the Cross. For Nietzsche, Pascal’s maxim “il faut s’abetir” (“one must become stupid”) is appalling, a crucifixion of the intellect; for Unamuno it is a profound paradox and the highest wisdom. Valéry’s Pascal is a sententious and badgering preacher, oblivious to the beauty of nature; the Pascal of Sainte-Beuve is an “athlete, martyr, and hero of the invisible moral world.” What Gilberte Perier refers to as her brother’s “second conversion,” Bertrand Russell regards as an act of “philosophical suicide.” And so on. In short, Pascal’s writings, and especially the Pensées, have served less as a window into the author’s soul than as a kind of mirror or prism reflecting the different outlooks and opinions of his readers.

Of course any proper summation of Pascal’s cultural legacy must include his contributions to probability theory and game theory and his invention of the mechanical computer (in honor of which the Swiss computer scientist Niklaus Wirth aptly named his new programming language Pascal). And, one must include all the other eponymous scientific, mathematical, and theological concepts (Pascal’s Theorem, Pascal’s Principle, Pascal’s Triangle, Pascal’s Wager, and so forth) that bear his name. In addition, every modern system of intra-urban or inter-urban shuttle transportation also owes a debt to the philosopher, who first conceived such a system and oversaw its original implementation in the city of Paris.

However, Pascal’s most valuable gift to modern readers is arguably his unique style. His combination of wit, irony, and aphorism, his ease and clarity, his air of someone skilled both in urbane conversation and erudite technical debate was to a large extent already present and on dazzling display in Montaigne. The same features reappear in the writings of Voltaire and the philosophes. And today, thanks largely to Pascal, these attributes have become a part of French literary tradition. However, what sets Pascal’s style apart, especially in the Pensées, is that supplemental to his characteristic élan and luster he adds a tone of existential angst: a visionary quality, together with an element of strangeness that is utterly foreign to the works of Montaigne and Voltaire but which appears powerfully in writers like Dante, Kafka, and Borges. Pascal’s imagination, like theirs, seems haunted by the notion of infinity and by images of mystery and turmoil; by circles, mazes, precipices, and abysses:

“At the far end of an infinite distance a coin is being spun . . .” 418/680.

 “Nature is an infinite sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere” 199/230.

Relatively few writers, and certainly few philosophers, have his uncanny quality, using that term in Freud’s sense as the ability to make familiar ideas seem strange and strange ideas seem familiar. Pater rightly called him the intellectual equivalent of lightning.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Texts and translations of works by Pascal

  • Faugère, Prosper, ed. The Miscellaneous Writings of Pascal (consisting of Letters, Essays, Conversations, and Miscellaneous Thoughts). George Pearce, tr. London: Longman, Brown, Green, and Longmans, 1849.
  • Mesnard, Jean, ed. Œuvres complètes de Pascal. 4 vols. (to date). Paris: Desclée de Brouwer, 1964-1992.
  • Pascal, Blaise, Gilberte Pascal Périer, and Louis Lafuma (ed). Oeuvres Complètes. Paris: Seuill, 1980.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Thoughts, Letters, and Opuscules. O. W. Wright, tr. New York: Hurd and Houghton, 1869.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Provincial LettersPenséesScientific Treatises. Chicago: Encyclopedia Britannica, 1952.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées. Roger Ariew, trans. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 2004.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées. AJ Krailsheimer, trans. New York: Penguin Books, 1995.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées and Other Writings. Honor Levi, trans. Anthony Levi, ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Provincial Letters, translated by Hilaire Belloc, Catholic Truth Society, 1921.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Édition de Pascal, Provinciales, Pensées et opuscules divers. Phillipe Sellier and G. Ferryrolles, eds. Paris: La Pochothèque, 2004.
  • Pascal, Jacqueline, Gilberte Pascal Périer, and Marguerite Périer. Lettres, opuscules et mémoires de madame Perier et de Jacqueline, soeurs de Pascal, et de Marguerite Perier, sa nièce: Publiés sur les manuscrits originaux par M. P. Faugère. Armand Prosper Faugère, ed. Paris: Auguste Vaton, 1845. (Elibron Classics replica edition, 2001.)

b. Biographical and critical studies

  • Bishop, Morris. Pascal: The Life of Genius. New York: Reynel & Hitchcock, 1936.
  • Bloom, Harold, ed. Blaise Pascal: Modern Critical Views. New York: Chelsea House, 1989.
  • Borges, Jorge Luis. “Pascal’s Sphere.” In Selected Non-Fictions. New York: Penguin Books, 1999.
  • Boyle, Robert. Hydrostatical Paradoxes: Made Out by New Experiments. Oxford: William Hall, 1666.
  • Cobb, William Frederick. “Pascal.” In James Hastings and John A. Selbie, eds. The Encyclopedia of Religion and Ethics, Part 18. Reprint. Whitefish, MT: Kessinger Publishing, 2003. 645-657.
  • Cousin, Victor. Études sur Pascal. 5th edition. Paris, Didier, 1857. Digitized by Google Books.
  • Davidson, Hugh M. Blaise Pascal. Boston: Twayne, 1983.
  • Edward, AWF. Pascal’s Arithmetical Triangle: The Story of a Mathematical Idea. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 2002.
  • Eliot, T.S. “The Pensées of Pascal.” Selected Essays. New York: Harcourt, Brace, and World, 1964; 355-368.
  • Faugere, Prosper. Génie et Écrits de Pascal. Paris, 1847. Digitized by Google Books.
  • Goldmann, Lucien. The Hidden God: A Study of Tragic Vision in the Pensées of Pascal and the Tragedies of Racine. Tr. Philip Thody. Brill, 1964.
  • Guardini, Romano. Pascal for Our Time. New York: Herder and Herder, 1966.
  • Hammond, Nicholas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Pascal. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • James, William. “The Will to Believe.” In Religion from Tolstoy to Camus. Walter Kaufmann, ed.  New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 2002. 221-238.
  • Jones, Matthew. The Good Life in the Scientific Revolution: Descartes, Pascal, Leibniz and the Cultivation of Virtue. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2006.
  • Kearns, Edward John. Ideas in Seventeenth-Century France. Manchester, UK: Manchester University Press, 1979.
  • Krailsheimer, A.J. Pascal. New York: Hill and Wang, 1980.
  • Melzer, Sara E. Discourse of the Fall: A Study of Pascal’s Pensées. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1986.
  • Mesnard, Jean. Pascal. Claude and Marcia Abraham, tr. Tuscaloosa, AL: University of Alabama Press, 1969.
  • Mesnard, Jean. Pascal: His Life and Works. London: Harvill Press, 1952.
  • Mill, J.S. “Theism.” In Three Essays on Religion. London: Longmans, Green, and Company, 1885.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich. On the Genealogy of Morals and Ecce Homo. Walter Kaufmann, tr. New York: Vintage Books, 1969.
  • Pater: "Pascal" in Miscellaneous Studies: A Series of Essays,London: MacMillan, 1920.
  • Périer, Gilberte Pascal. La vie de M. Pascal. Paris: Lettres Moderne, 1964.
  • Peters, James R. The Logic of the Heart: Augustine, Pascal, and the Rationality of Faith. Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Publishing, 2009.
  • Sainte-Beuve, Charles Augustin. “Pascal.” In Essays, volume 1.  London: Gibbings and Company Limited, 1901, pp. 1-15.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul. “Freedom and Responsibility.” In The Philosophy of Existentialism: Selected Essays. New York: Philosophical Library, 1965.
  • Sellier, Phillipe. Pascal et Saint Augustin. Paris: A. Colin, 1970.
  • Vainio, Olli-Pekka. Beyond Fideism: Negotiable Religious Identities. Surrey, UK: Ashgate Publishing, 2010.
  • Valéry, Paul. “Variation sur une ‘Pensèe.’” Revue Hebdomadaire, XXXII (July 14, 1923), 161-170.
  • Voltaire. Philosophical Letters. Mineola, NY: Dover Publications, 2003.
  • Wallace, David Foster. Everything and More: A Compact History of Infinity. New York: WW Norton, 2003.
  • Wetsel, David. L’Écriture et le Reste: The Pensées of Pascal in the Exegetical Tradition of Port-Royal. Columbus, Ohio: The Ohio State University Press, 1981.
  • Wood, William. Blaise Pascal on Duplicity, Sin, and the Fall: The Secret Instinct. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013.

 

Author Information

David Simpson
Email: dsimpson@depaul.edu
Depaul University
U. S. A.

Friedrich Nietzsche: Philosophy of History

NietzscheNietzsche was well-steeped in his contemporary methods and debates in the philosophy of history, which carried over into his philosophy in essential ways. Once a prodigy in classical philology, Nietzsche’s philosophy is everywhere concerned with traditions, historical shifts in custom and meaning, and, to adapt his key expression, "how things become what they are". Beyond these, Nietzsche was closely concerned with the manner these traditions are recorded, emphasized or covered over, as accords the subjective dynamic of those who would claim to know and re-present the past. His earliest philosophical books are marked by an attempt to incorporate Schopenhauer’s notion of timeless ideas into Jakob Burckhardt’s language of historiographical typology. His middle and mature works offer important critiques of both sides of the 19th Century ‘history wars’. Against the Hegelians, Nietzsche rejects efforts to systemize history within rational frameworks as well as teleological schemes generally. Against the ‘Berlin School’ of scientific historiography, he rejects the possibility of subject-free objectivity, realist description, and deductive explanations as to why things happened as they did. In his later thinking, Nietzsche devises his own genealogical mode of writing about the past in response to evolutionary accounts of the development of morals.

This article will trace the context and evolution of Nietzsche’s philosophy of history throughout his career. Attention will be paid, too, to its reception by thinkers in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries.

Table of Contents

  1. Schulpforta
  2. Bonn and Leipzig
  3. Basel
  4. Physiognomy and Teleology
  5. Réealism and Genealogy
  6. Reception
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. Schulpforta

Nietzsche enrolled at Schulpforta in 1858 at the age of fourteen. The four hundred year-old school was long the standard of humane education in Germany. During Nietzsche’s time there, the character of the school mirrored that of its most venerable literary scholar and historian Friedrich August Koberstein. Embracing those same two disciplines himself, Nietzsche’s first extensive historiographical project covered the saga of the fourth century Ostrogoth King Ermanarich (KGW I/2, 274-284). Even then Nietzsche tried his hand at various historiographic expressions. In 1861, he wrote a symphonic poem entitled Serbia (BAW 2, 32-37). The following year, he presented to his friends Wilhelm Pinder and Gustav Krug three additional “Hungarian Sketches” in imitation of Liszt, whose daughter Cosima was to become Cosima van Bulow and then Cosima Wagner. In the fall of that year, Nietzsche outlined the composition of a dramatic production entitled ‘Ermanarich’ (BAW 2, 144-54), and as late as the summer of 1865, he was considering the performance of an Ermanarich, Oper in drei Akten (BAW 3, 123-4).

Nietzsche’s problem, foremost, is one of conflicting historical sources. Ermanarich, king of Oium in the early 300’s, had been confused over time with various old tribal kings of gothic Germany, like Hermenrich and Emelrich, and the old Danish tribal leader Jarmarich of whom Saxo Grammaticus spoke (BAW 2, 306). His name is Eormenric in the English epic Beowulf and Jörmunrekkr in old Norse songs. His story had been manipulated most egregiously by the chroniclers of the Anglo-Saxons who sought to associate the notoriously cruel and rapacious traits of Attila the Hun with all of their Eastern foes. Whoever Ermanarich actually was, and whatever the factual details of his life and death were, is likely unrecoverable given the discontinuity of the extant historical evidence. But Nietzsche did not rest at the level of philological skepticism. In this, as in his earliest published articles on Theognis and Diogenes Laertius, he constructed a speculative character portrait intended to fill in the missing pieces of the historical story. Such a two-phase meta-historical standpoint—a skeptical realism about the historical sources combined with a psychological constructivism—was indeed cultivated by the instructors at Schulpforta. As Nietzsche’s close friend Karl von Gersdorff would later recall, “[Kobertsein] was pleased in the highest and full of praise for the erudition, the perspicacity, the deductive character and stylistic elegance of his student” (Janz 1993, I 96).

From his work at Schulpforta one can at least begin to outline Nietzsche’s historiographical education in contradistinction to other reigning views. In contrast to Enlightenment historiographers like Voltaire or Gibbon, the young Nietzsche never valorizes his historical figures to make them stand as moral exemplars for our own edification in humanistic ideals. None of the personalities he constructs are enlightened models of rational clarity; each evoke much darker and more earthly psychological compulsions. Nietzsche’s early philological scholarship is in this way more reminiscent of romantic historiography, a likely mark of Koberstein’s influence. Along with Carlyle, Michelet, Schiller, Goethe, and Macaulay, the young Nietzsche conceived the constructive task of the historian as that of a dramaturge who imbues his characters with personality in order to re-enliven formerly lifeless aspects of the past. In the 1850’s and 60’s, the meta-historical theory simultaneously most popular among philosophers and most tendentious among historians was doubtless that put forward by the Hegelian-Marxists. It is apparent that Nietzsche’s Ermanarich project—or for that matter any of his published philology—does not bear even the slightest resemblance to a teleological account, whether idealist or materialist. Ermanarich is not some moment in the march of history, nor some typological phenomenon characteristic of an epoch. Indeed, the conservative religious and constitutionalist leanings of Schulpforta would hardly have been conducive to the Hegelian-Marxist way of thinking.

2. Bonn and Leipzig

Friedrich August Wolf is typically considered the father of German philology. Wolf provided the study of antiquity, more than a generation before Ranke did for historiography generally, its first systematic set of methods and its first aspiration to achieve the same sort of demonstrable progress and rigor as the natural sciences. Wolf’s two most important descendants, Gottfried Hermann and August Boeckh, founded two groups of scholars with antipodal methodologies: the Sprachphilologen and the Sachphilologen respectively. For the former, the scientific status of philology entailed both certainty and objectivity, which in turn meant avoiding as much as possible the intrusion of subjective interpretations of evidence.  To do that, the Sprachphilologen narrowed their net of acceptable evidence to that which allegedly needed no interpretation, to that form of evidence whose meaning would allegedly be manifest to whoever could observe it: the written word. The Sachphilologen, on the contrary, considered science as a means of circumscribing the whole of experience. That whole, with respect to antiquity, could be elucidated in part through written accounts, to be sure, but only in part. What counted equally as evidence were the artifacts of antiquity: the plastic arts, the architecture, the coinage, even the clothing, athletics, tools, and playthings. None of these phenomena speaks for itself in the way the written word does. Each requires the understanding of the historian to reconstruct what their meaning might have been—each historical phenomenon, in other words, is meaningful only within a scheme of hermeneutical interpretation. Something of the objectivity and exactitude is lost therein; but the sacrifice is repaid by attaining a more comprehensive sense of antiquity through the totality of its artifacts.

The overwhelming portion of training Nietzsche received in the methods of professional historiography was philological. But in place of a single unitary lesson, Nietzsche found himself immersed directly in a debate about the meaning of the field itself during his education at both Bonn and Leipzig. His teacher Friedrich Ritschl was the student of Hermann and of Hermann’s student Karl Christian Reisig. Otto Jahn, like Nietzsche a Schulpforta graduate, went on to study with Hermann in Leipzig and Lachmann in Berlin. But Jahn was also a student of Boeckh at Berlin, and was considered alongside his friend Theodor Mommsen one of the defenders of Sachphilologie.

Ritschl’s pedagogy mimicked Wolf’s in its holistic approach to shaping not just scholars but men. Yet in his scholarship, he was clearly an adherent of the rigor and discipline of Hermann’s Sprachphilologie. Jahn was equally scientific in terms of rigor. But in keeping with Sachphilologie, he ventured beyond the written word and investigated the wholeness of culture, especially by applying philological methodology to the objects of archeology. In the school year of 1864-5, the same year that Nietzsche entered Bonn, Ritschl and Jahn engaged in a petty yet field-altering squabble that came to be known as the Bonnerstreit. Although Nietzsche took Jahn’s side in the matter—as he wrote to Gersdorff, “Here in Bonn the biggest flap, the worst cattiness about the Jahn-Ritschlstreit still dominates. I consider Jahn unconditionally right” (an Gersdorff 25.5.1865, KSB 2, 56)—he nevertheless had no palpable interest in Jahn’s archeological, artistic, or numismatical studies. His philological articles in those years on Theognis and Diogenes Laertius show a methodological allegiance to Ritschl’s Sprachphilologie, and retain the basic strategy of his earlier effort on Ermanarich in that they rely both on a skeptical realism about the authenticity of the texts and the construction of a Charakterbild in order to supply the psychological motivations for the agents’ behaviors in the historical stories. Both of Nietzsche’s projects were lauded by Ritschl, who transferred to the University of Leipzig, and indeed both were published in his still-active journal, Rheinisches Museum für Philologie. On their merits, Nietzsche famously graduated from Leipzig without a formal dissertation and was given appointment at the University of Basel as a replacement for another of Ritschl’s students, Adolf Kiessling.

3. Basel

In 1869, Nietzsche presented the lecture “Homer und die klassische Philologie” (KGW II/1, 247-69), full of hope for the potential of a renewed and invigorated field. Toward the end of the lecture, however, he declares that that goal must be accomplished by recognizing a new philosophical basis, that “each and every philological activity should be enclosed by and proceed from a philosophical worldview” (KGW II/1, 268). The reference is clearly to Schopenhauer, whom he had begun to read already in the Fall of 1865. Nietzsche and most of his associates at the time sought to combine Schopenhauer’s teaching with historiography. His childhood friend Paul Deussen studied oriental history and culture with Swami Vivekananda—and would found the Schopenahuer-Gesellschaft in 1911. Richard Wagner, who fancied himself at times the reviver of the ‘true’ historical Germanic culture, sent a personal copy of his Nibelungen directly to Schopenhauer, and sometimes touted that his opera was the expression of Schopenhauer's aesthetics. Erwin Rohde, himself the author of what remains one of the finest scholarly books on Ancient mystery cults and ‘Dionysian’ culture, Psyche: Seelencult und Unsterblichkeitsglaube der Griechen (1890-4), was a lifelong Schopenhauerian. Johann Jacob Bachofen’s psychology of the dark anti-rational undercurrents of ancient history in his Das Mutterrecht (1861) and his critique of scientific ‘objectivity’ both intimate Schopenhauerian influence. And although he is sometimes thought to be anti-philosophical, Jakob Burckhardt was an overt Schopenhauerian—as well as the most renowned cultural historian of his generation.

Nietzsche and Burckhardt had similar upbringings insofar as their introductions to the critical methods of philology extinguished the flame of their devotion to Christianity. Like Burckhardt, too, Nietzsche came to view the obsessive source criticism of Sprachphilologie as a necessary correction of romantic historiography, but also as a potentially detrimental step in the development of an individual scholar and, eventually, in the development of culture. The concern for both at this time is not to report the past with an unattainable degree of objectivity, “wie es eigentlich gewesen ist,” as Burckhardt’s teacher Leopold von Ranke demanded. Rather, “a single source happily chosen can,” for Burckhardt, “do duty for a whole multitude of possible other sources, since he who is really determined to learn, that is, to become rich in spirit, can by a simple unction of his mind, discern and feel the general in the particular” (Burckhardt 1930-4, VII 15). Burckhardt sought to intuit that which was constant, universal, and typical from the welter of particular passing forms. Like Schopenhauer, who himself—despite a massive historical erudition and a cordial acquaintance with Wolf—had almost nothing positive to say about historiography, Burckhardt believed that only the timeless and universal could rise to the level of truth, hence his and Nietzsche’s focus on Kulturgeschichte rather than the passing intrigues of political history. Furthermore, like Nietzsche (at least in these years), but in contradistinction to Schopenhauer, Burckhardt believed that the proper study of history could reveal precisely that: typological traits within people, forms of personalities, and characteristics of epochs. As Burckhardt writes, “Our point of departure is the one and the only thing which lasts in history and is its only possible center: man, this suffering, striving and active being, as he is and was and will forever be” (Burckhardt 1930-4, VII, 3). Indeed, as Nietzsche echoes in his preface to his Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (1873), “I am going to emphasize only that point of each of their systems which constitutes a piece of character and hence belongs to that non-controvertible, non-discussable evidence which it is the task of history to preserve: […]” (PtG, P; KSA 1, 801f). For both Burckhardt and Nietzsche, what was most worthy of being taken up by history was never the common or mundane person, but the ‘great man’. For Burckhardt this mainly meant the leading figures of Renaissance Italy, while for Nietzsche, Pre-Socratic Greeks appeared like giants calling to each other in the spirit of competition from atop high mountain peaks.

However true to the philosophy of Schopenhauer Burckhardt styled himself, his conception of the historian’s ability to intuit common formal patterns within the myriad variegations of historical personages was closer to Goethe’s morphology than to Schopenhauer’s aesthetische Anschauung (Gay 1974, 178f). For Goethe, the close observation of the biological development of organic objects, as much as the composition of the dramatic development of a literary character, would reveal Urphänomene or the primary forms of the phenomenon which guided their development. In his dramatic works, Goethe sought to portray the Steigerung of typological characters like Werther, Tasso, or Goetz, whose development over time is not the alteration or transformation of character but its intensification over time. Burckhardt thought the historian’s task was similar insofar as the careful study of historical documents would reveal typological traits among great people, the course of whose development only intensified what was necessarily there from the start.

For Schopenhauer, by contrast, aesthetic intuition was never about discovering typical recurrences in history or a developmental intensification, but gazing beyond the ‘veil of Maya’ in a partial break from the spatio-temporal forms of subjective willing. Aesthetic intuition for Schopenhauer was a non-intellectual and thus non-discursive Auffassung of the Ideas which constitute the first objectification of the one panenthetic Will (that is, the will of a God who is everywhere and in everything). Aesthetic apprehension can only occur when these instrumental satisfactions in the here and now have been removed entirely, when the will of the spectator is silenced. In contrast to art, historiography was merely like science insofar as it only ever studied its objects subjectively, that is, insofar as they might satisfy the demands of the individuated will (Schopenhauer 1977, X/2 459f). Just as the sciences study their objects in order to use them, benefit from them, or solve problems with them, historians only research the topics they do with an eye toward explaining what was previously unknown, solving mysteries, or perhaps toward finding insights to contemporary problems. Indeed, precisely because of the subjective and necessarily temporal judgments of history, Schopenhauer, in opposition to both Burckhardt and Nietzsche at this time, esteemed history insufficient to attain the “deep truths” of the world in the manner of great art. “Wherever it is a question of knowledge of cause and effect or of grounds and consequences of any kind,” writes Schopenhauer, “that is to say in all branches of natural science and mathematics, as also in history, or with inventions, etc., the knowledge sought must be an aim of the will” (Schopenhauer 1977, X/2, 459f). Burckhardt and Nietzsche both thought that history failed to attain the level of science, but for different reasons. Unlike science, history is unable to construct laws by which the historian might predict future cases, and, more importantly, should not try to be scientific since its proper aim was not understanding but creating values. But although Burckhardt had nothing to do with the mystical elements of Schopenhauer’s thought, his younger Basel colleague was less concerned with scholarly restraint.

To Burckhardt’s and Ritschl’s consternation, Nietzsche tried to co-opt the Schopenhauerian aesthetic-metaphysical mysticism in his first ‘historical’ work, The Birth of Tragedy (1872). “But our Nietzsche!” Ritschl would write to Wilhelm Vischer, the man who a few years before hired Nietzsche at Basel, “It’s remarkable how in one person two souls live next to each other. On the one side, the strictest method of academic scientific research…on the other this fantastically-overreaching, over enthusiastic, beat-you-senseless, Wagnerian-Schopenhauerian art-mystery-religion-crap [Kunstmysterienreligionsschwärmerei]! […] What really makes me mad is his impiety against his true mother, who had suckled him at her breast: philology” (KSA 15, 46f). The justification for Nietzsche’s claims about the ‘inner’ or ‘real’ nature of tragedy was never intended to have utilized the same methodology as his earlier philology, no longer aiming at a correspondence between the account and what the evidence portrays to be real, as Ritschl sensed easily enough. In claiming that the real origin of tragedy is a happy confluence of Dionysian and Apolline drives at a particular moment in history, Nietzsche instead makes an intuitional claim that transgresses the boundaries of naturalistic explanation. Nietzsche, as Jahn’s student Ulrich von Wilamowitz Moellendorff famously charged, shunned source criticism, neglected linguistic analysis, couldn’t be bothered to footnote, was generally ignorant of archeology, and “revile[d] the historical-critical method, denouncing any intuition which deviates from his own, and [ascribed] a ‘complete misunderstanding of the study of antiquity’ to the age in which philology in Germany, due to Gottfried Hermann and Karl Lachmann was raised to an unprecedented height” (Wilamowitz-Moellendorff 1872, 5). Beyond traditional historical versions of intuition in the manner of Herder or Burckhardt, Nietzsche’s believes his own intuitions about tragedy are true precisely insofar as he has left the phenomenal realm behind and become identified with the inner nature of the tragic world in-itself. Through a sort of mystical echo of the ancient standard of truth as identity between the subject and object, the principle that “like is known by like,” Nietzsche thinks he can communicate the real inner Idea of tragedy:

Only insofar as the genius, during the act of artistic procreation, merges fully with that original artist of the world does he know anything of the eternal essence of art; for in this condition he resembles, miraculously, that uncanny image of fairy-tale which can turn its eyes around and look at itself; now he is at one and the same time subject and object, simultaneously poet, actor, and spectator. (BT 5, KSA 1, 47f.)

Like Wagner, who in his own aesthetic ecstasy was claimed by Nietzsche to have attained a “sort of omniscience [Allwissenheit] … as if the visual power of his eyes hovered not only upon surfaces, but ‘ins Innere’” (BT 22, KSA 1, 140), Nietzsche believed himself to inhabit the sort of aesthetic state of Schopenhauer’s genius. “I had discovered the only historical simile and facsimile of my own innermost experience,—and this led me to apprehend the amazing phenomenon of the Dionysian…” (EH 'Geburt' 2, KSA 6, 311). Another retrospective evaluation claims the work was, “Constructed entirely from precocious, wet-behind-the-ears personal experiences, all of which lay at the very threshold of what could be communicated.” This was apparently because the work was not scientific-philology but was, “located in the territory of art […] perhaps a book for artists with some subsidiary capacity for analysis and retrospection (in other words, for an exceptional type of artist […]), full of psychological innovations and artist-mysteries, with an artist’s metaphysics in the background…” (BT 'Versuch' 2, KSA 1, 13).

4. Physiognomy and Teleology

Shortly before the Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche wrote to Erwin Rohde that “Scholarship, art, and philosophy are growing together inside me to such an extent that one day I’m bound to give birth to centaurs” (Letter to Rohde, January 15th, 1870; KSB 3, 95). Indeed, the book was just that, though it was no longer something to be proud of. Almost immediately after, Nietzsche rescinded his artistic-mystical view about the historian’s ability to intuit the real Ideas, in Schopenhauer’s technical sense, of the nature of tragedy beyond the mediated observation of the past through historical evidence. “For the readers of my earlier writings I wish to expressly clarify that I have abandoned the metaphysical-artistic views that fundamentally govern them” (N Ende 1876-Sommer 1877 23[159], KSA 8, 463). His increasingly skeptical attitude toward the mystical aspect of Schopenhauer’s philosophy led Nietzsche to revise major aspects of his own thought.

In 1874’s vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben, Nietzsche presents three ‘types’ of historian, the critical, antiquarian, and monumental. None of these “merges with the original artist of the world”; none becomes the “subject and object” of their historical study. Instead, each type of historian represents the past according to the rules of an inner necessity, exaggerating or downplaying certain aspects of the past in order to tear down idols, preserve them, or build them up. Each type of historian and their accordant way of representing the past has its advantages and disadvantages for themselves and for the cultures in which they live, but none is able to represent the past as it ‘really’ was since into each of their judgments intrudes their psychologically-determined desires and interests.

If it is, as Nietzsche begins to think, that all judgments are constituted by unconscious psychological dynamics, then the ‘subject-free’ ideal of objectivity must be jettisoned. Certainly, the Schopenhauerian aesthetic escape from individual subjectivity will be impossible; but so will the Rankean ‘disinterested’ vision of scientific objectivity. The best one can hope for historians, Nietzsche thinks, is that the subjective facticities that distort their judgments would be in some sense ‘healthy’, or at least healthier than those judgments that infect modern schoolbooks. Only the strong have the right sort of subjective dynamics that would enable a healthy interpretation of historical events. “If you are to venture to interpret the past you can do so only out of the fullest exertion of the vigor of the present: only when you put forth your noblest qualities in all their strength will you divine what is worth knowing and preserving in the past. Like to like! Otherwise, you will draw the past down to you. Do not believe historiography that does not spring from the head of the rarest minds…” (UB II 6, KSA 1, 293f).

By looking at the psychological conditions within which historians construct their accounts, Nietzsche effectively focuses the ‘historical sense’—“the capacity for quickly guessing the order of rank of the valuations according to which a people, a society, a human being has lived” (BGE 224, KSA 5, 157)—on the historians themselves. “History belongs above all to the active and powerful man,” Nietzsche proclaims—like Schiller or Goethe who view the past as a model for inspiration, not merely to imitate, but as an “incentive to do as others have done and do it better” (UB II, 2,  KSA 1, 259). Among those with highly-ranked drives Nietzsche declares Burckhardt (see among many examples, N Frühling-Sommer 1875 5[58], KSA 8, 56), Thucydides (e.g., GD Antike 2, KSA 6, 155f), Hekataeus (KGW II/5, 229f), Tacitus (N 1885 43[3], KSA 11, 702), Hippolyte Taine (JGB 254, KSA 5, 198), and Ritschl (EH 'klug' 9, KSA 6, 295). Among those badly ranked are Karl Lachmann (N März 1875 3[36], KSA 8, 24), the historian of ancient philosophy Eduard Zeller (KGB II/1, 124), and Overbeck’s confidant Heinrich von Treitschke (EH 'Wagner' 3, KSA 6, 361). Relegated to a secondary consideration is whether these historians’ ‘facts’ are accurate; what is time and again foregrounded is the order of rank of the values and drives according to which their historiographical accounts are constructed.

The same is true of Nietzsche’s evaluation of teleological historiography. Although David Friedrich Strauss (see the entirety of UB I, KSA 1, 159-242) and Hegel (see N Frühling-Sommer 1875 5[58], KSA 8, 57) are also targets, much of what Nietzsche says in the latter chapters of Nutzen und Nachteil about teleological historiography is directed against Eduard von Hartmann (see also N 1884 26[326], KSA 11, 236; N November 1887-März 1888 11[61], KSA 13, 30). Hartmann’s philosophical history of consciousness was largely a synthesis of Schopenhauer’s depiction of the blind world will and Hegel’s teleological unfolding of both mind and the rational course of history itself (Hartmann 1923, I 329). Spiritual and moral progress are guaranteed by the Divine Will, whose ideas are instantiated first within the unconscious desires and drives of early peoples and then in an ever-increasing degree of conscious reflection within civilized nations. The aims of the Divine Will are accomplished, consciously or otherwise, regardless of whatever individuals would like to make of their futures.

Hartmann and the sort of Hegelian teleological historicism he represents have, of course, gone out of fashion. It would be rather absurd in today’s more naturalistic historiographical climate to try to prove that a particular decision by a particular agent was the effect of the Divine Will’s cosmic plan; but the focus of Nietzsche’s critique lay elsewhere. In keeping with his view that judgments are necessarily a function of the psychological fundament of their authors, Nietzsche targets the underlying motivations that would lead Hartmann, and for that matter Hegel, to interpret the historical world as teleological in the first place. What he discovers in these teleological historians is a ‘cynical’ outlook on life generally. Instead of a grim determination to affirm their lives they surrender themselves to the recognition that nothing they do is anything more than a preordained stepping-stone on the march toward the absolute. Teleological historians are driven by a nihilistic desire, by the need, Nietzsche contends, to absolve their own wills: “die volle Hingabe der Persönlichkeit an den Weltprozess” [the total sacrifice of individuality to the world-process] (UB II 9, KSA 1, 316). This surrender of today for the sake of some promised future ideal is a secularized version, Nietzsche ultimately thinks, of the Christian faith in heaven.

Although positivism and teleology are nearly antonyms today, this was not the case in Nietzsche’s century. Comte, and his sociological and economical descendants such as Durkheim and Marx, each envisioned an epochal and progressive scheme of history—a sort of one-way street from a repressed past to an enlightened future. Both, however, were careful to replace Hegel and Hartmann’s extra-natural teleological movers in history with a positivist or materialist theory of explanation respectively. In doing so, they considered their developmental schemes both equally demonstrable and as necessary as those of the natural sciences. “All historical writing,” Marx tells us, “must set out from these natural bases and their modification in the course of history through the action of men” (Marx & Engels 1845, 36). “Scientific history, or sociology,” according to Durkheim, “must be founded upon the direct observation of concrete facts” (Durkheim 1972, 78). Such scientific historical representations rested on their shared hope of ascribing causes that governed the behaviors of either individuals or groups as they undergo their progressive development, and that hope can be traced back to H.T. Buckle, the original ‘scientific historian’, whom Nietzsche himself recognizes in this context (See GM I 4, KSA 5, 262).

Nietzsche rejected grand architectonics whose purpose seemed only to convince people that they will someday soon be better off. He also criticized the efforts to regard the past as unfolding even to non-teleological laws insofar as their effort to deduce nomothetically betrayed either their desire to predict and thereby control future events or else their fear of the unknown. “In other disciplines, generalizations [Allgemeinheiten] are the most important thing since they contain the laws [Gesetze]. But if such assertions as that cited are meant to be valid laws, then we could reply that the historian’s work is wasted. For whatever truth is left in such statements, after subtracting that mysterious and irreducible residue we mentioned earlier, is obvious and even trivial since it is self-evident to anyone with the slightest range of experience” (UB II 6, KSA 1, 291f). While there may have been a certain admiration for positivism’s rigorous and anti-metaphysical methodologies, Nietzsche says very little about any of these proto-sociologists. Most notoriously, Nietzsche never names Marx a single time anywhere in his writing.

5. Réealism and Genealogy

Nietzsche’s rejection of nomothetic schemata that purport to explain historical change, whether metaphysical or naturalistic, does not imply he was a radical outlier of the ‘historical’ 19th-Century. Every bit as historically-concerned as the teleologists, he thinks “philosophy, or that alone which I count it to be, [is] the most general form of history, the attempt to somehow describe and abbreviate in signs the Heraclitean world of becoming…” (N 1885 36[27], KSA 11, 562). Nietzsche’s attempt at historicizing philosophy would endure longer than his friendship with the man who helped to inspire it. For alongside Paul Rée he came to the conviction that values, whether moral, political, aesthetic, or even metaphysical, were a function of drives which were themselves conditioned subconsciously throughout a long historical process. Old religious and Platonic beliefs in good and evil as static metaphysical entities were, for both Rée and Nietzsche, to be replaced with a naturalistic and developmental account about how present-day values derive from a convoluted process of practical and often egoistical considerations. But where for Rée, like Darwin and Lamarck before him, acquired habits become inherited traits due to their role in helping both individuals and societies survive better relative to their competitors, Nietzsche viewed the historical inculcation of moral sentiments as a reflection of group attempts to instantiate power-aims.

In keeping with his exhortation that philosophy become historical, Nietzsche variously endeavors to construct a ‘history of the moral sensations’, a ‘natural history of morals’, and most famously, a Genealogy of Morals (1887), a book whose mission is derived from a deeply historicist conviction. “[W]e need to know about the conditions and circumstances under which the values grew up, developed, and changed…” (GM P 6, KSA 5, 253). To that end, Nietzsche would seem to require a set of demonstrable historical premises: that there really was a time during which a masterly set of values dominated and a later time at which it became displaced by the widely-flung inversion of those values known as slave morality. Indeed he claims to seek, “morality as it really existed and was really lived,” “the real history of morality,” which can “actually be confirmed and has actually existed” (GM P 7, KSA 5, 254).

But doing so enmeshes Nietzsche in considerable meta-historical problems, some of which he himself poses. The Genealogie is above all an attempt to articulate the history of the development of moral values in a way that undermines his contemporaries’ faith in the absoluteness of their own values. It does so on two levels: first by offering an historical explanation that reveals the intrinsically historical rather than absolute character of moral values. Nietzsche had formidable allies on this score in Rée and the ‘English School’ of moral psychology—represented foremost by Herbert Spencer—both of whom followed Charles Darwin’s intimation that even morality should be viewed as an evolutionary phenomenon. But whereas their interpretation of that evolution seemed to guarantee the progressive status of fundamentally Christian values like altruism, honesty, cooperation, and compassion, Nietzsche’s own psychologizing-historiography uncovered a darker underside of morality. In fact, as has been thoroughly argued, the text itself represents something like a new-Darwinism (Richardson 2004) or anti-Darwinism (Johnson 2010), insofar as it rejects evolutionary progress and substitutes a vision of the ‘competition of wills’ as a mechanism to explain historical change. Nietzsche rejects the Darwinian accounts by dismantling their presumptions about the origin of value resting with the recipient rather than the doer of ‘good’ or ‘bad’ deeds, about nature aiming at preservation rather than overcoming, about the passivity and accidental character of propagatory success, and about the possibility and value of altruism within social frameworks. The success of this refutation rests in its being somehow a ‘better’ historical account than social-Darwinian alternative, that is, a more accurate and comprehensive historical account than theirs. Given that Nietzsche offers scant historical data that would support his own interpretation of events—the few proffered etymologies would hardly prove much—his account, as an objective history of morality largely fails to demonstrate Nietzsche’s counter-hypotheses.

It is on the second level, a meta-historical level, that Nietzsche’s Genealogie proves its enduring originality. Nietzsche shows that the very attempt to reconstruct the story of development of morality “as it really happened” is occluded by the recognition that the narrator of events is intrinsic to the story, that the historian himself is no will-less, objective, static point of observation, but was himself a perpetually becoming, value-laden dynamic of subjectivity, who is every bit as historical and drive-constituted as the values he was trying to explain. Contrary to Darwinians of any stripe, Nietzsche recognized that historiography is never about ‘getting the facts straight’, ‘wie es eigentlich gewesen ist’, but about interpreting it according to the drive-informed perspective in which the historian was embedded. Whereas the Darwinians interpreted the historical evolution of morality as if they themselves stood outside of it, for Nietzsche, “[W]e count—after the fact—all the twelve trembling strokes of the clock of our experience, our lives, our being—alas! In the process we keep losing the count. So we remain necessarily strangers to ourselves, we do not understand ourselves, we have to keep ourselves confused” (GM P 1, KSA 5, 247). Values and also that conception of ourselves as the architects of values dynamically affects the way by which one interprets those values, such that the attempt to re-present the ‘first bell’, that original value, free of the distortions of generations of overwriting, reformulating, and above all re-valuing those values, becomes impossible.

How have the moral genealogists reacted so far in this matter? Naively, as is their wont: they highlight some ‘purpose’ in punishment, for example, revenge or deterrence, then innocently place the purpose at the start, as causa fiendi of punishment, and—have finished. But ‘purpose in law’ is the last thing we should apply to the history of the emergence of law: on the contrary, there is no more important proposition for every sort of history than that which we arrive at only with great effort but which we really should reach,—namely that the origin of the emergence of a thing and its ultimate usefulness, its practical application and incorporation into a system of ends, are toto coelo separate; that anything in existence, having somehow come about, is continually interpreted anew, requisitioned anew, transformed and redirected to a new purpose by a power superior to it; that everything that occurs in the organic world consists of overpowering, dominating, and in their turn, overpowering and dominating consist of re-interpretation, adjustment, in the process of which their former ‘meaning’ and ‘purpose’ must necessarily be obscured or completely obliterated. [...] But every purpose and use is just a sign that the will to power has achieved mastery over something less powerful, and has impressed upon it its own meaning of a use function; and the whole history of a ‘thing’, an organ, a tradition can to this extent be a continuous chain of signs, continually revealing new interpretations and adaptations, the causes of which need not be connected even amongst themselves, but rather sometimes just follow and replace one another at random. (GM II, 12; KSA 5, 312)

As this passage offers the most expansive explication of his mature historical theory, it is worth careful investigation. There seem to be three interrelated theses here. First, history practiced rightly must accord the genuine nature of reality. Other ‘genealogists’, who in this context are represented primarily by Nietzsche’s one-time friend Paul Rée and the Darwin-inspired moralists such as Herbert Spencer, are in a better position than ahistorical philosophers such as Plato and Spinoza insofar as they rightly recognize the fluidity of moral concepts. However, where the naively realist genealogists go wrong is in unreflectively presuming that their own interpretations of those moral concepts are somehow true for all time and all people, in other words, that their interpretations of the flow of history somehow stand outside the flow of history (see also Johnson 2010, 116-148; Born 2010, 202-52).

Second, Nietzsche’s mature genealogy adapts what might be called an anti-realist theory of historical explanation and description. Terms like ‘cause’, ‘effect’, and ‘purpose’ are not elements of a ‘real’ world, but signs that have been found useful for communicating meaning intersubjectively. Descriptions like ‘terrorist’, ‘revolution’, and ‘democracy’ identify in language what is actually a non-identical set of loosely-connected phenomena.

Third, and as a consequence of the first two theses, there can be no single ‘absolute’ interpretation of the past. Interpretations are a function of the historical world. Like all phenomena, they change and transmogrify over time in accordance to the deep and often unconscious demands of the agents who construct, accept, or reject those interpretations. The example of punishment in this passage illustrates particularly well how the meaning of a single word shifts over epochs and cultures. What accounts for that shift is the fluctuating power dynamics both within particular historians and among the wider sphere of what a culture considers an historical ‘fact’ over time.

Despite his conviction that philosophy must be historical, then, Nietzsche simultaneously understood writing philosophy historically to be a deeply problematic endeavor. Any attempt to describe or explain a historical event amounts to an illegitimate de-contextualization, an attempt to affix the unaffixable with allegedly static concepts. As he would write to his friend, the historical theologian Franz Overbeck, “At last my mistrust now turns to the question whether history is actually possible? What, then does one want to ascertain [feststellen]?—something, which in a moment of happening, does not itself ‘stand fast’ [‘feststand’]?” (an Overbeck 23.02.1887, KSB 8, 28). The situation is made worse in recognizing that not only is the reality to be described in a state of flux, but the one who recognizes it is in a similar state of flux. Not only has Heraclitus’s river changed, so has the subjectivity of the one who has entered it.

A similar cluster of problems was faced by Neo-Kantian thinkers in the years just following Nietzsche’s Genealogie. Wilhelm Windelband, Heinrich Rickert, and the quasi-Neo-Kantian Wilhelm Dilthey were each keen in their own ways to view historical judgment as a function of subjective facticities rather than as a mirror of an objective past. Each sought, like Nietzsche, to distinguish history from science both in terms of the methodology of its investigations and the sorts of objects it studies. Where science seeks to explain by deduction from general rules, history only contains such generalities in imprecise abstractions. Due to the singularity of every object under its purview, history cannot hope to explain scientifically by means of deduction under general laws. As Windelband phrases it in his inaugural address as rector at Strasbourg, “The nomological sciences are concerned with what is invariably the case. The sciences of process are concerned with what once was the case” (Windelband 1894, 175). The former sciences were famously designated nomothetic, the latter, like historiography, called idiographic. Finally, while historiography does involve the search for explanations in terms of causes, those causes must be regarded as value-imbued. “History,” Rickert writes, “with its individualizing method and its orientation to values, has to investigate the causal relations subsisting among the unique and individual events with which it is concerned. These causal relations do not coincide with any universal laws of nature…the selection of what is essential in history involves reference to values even in the inquiry into causes…” (Rickert 1889, 94; see also Windelband 1884, 205). In place of a universal dogmatic positivist explanation, philosophers of history following the neo-Kantians address which causal account best satisfies the subjective standards of the historians and of their audience. Compare this to Nietzsche’s claim in Ecce Homo, that “we are not looking for just any type of explanatory cause, we are looking for a chosen, preferred type of explanation, one that will most quickly and reliably get rid of the feeling of unfamiliarity and novelty, the feeling that we are dealing with something we have never encountered before,—the most common explanation” (GD Irrthümer 5, KSA 6.93).

6. Reception

Nietzsche rejects attempts to construe a past in-itself without acknowledging the tangled but inextricable web of interpretations cast upon it by later interpreters. “[T]he origin of the emergence of a thing and its ultimate usefulness, its practical application and incorporation into a system of ends, are toto coelo separate; anything in existence, having somehow come about, is continually interpreted anew, requisitioned anew, transformed and redirected to a new purpose” (GM II 12, KSA 5, 313). Any attempt to isolate Nietzsche’s historiographical ideas for the sake of contextualizing them would accordingly demand a reckoning of the many drives of its very many interpreters over the past century or so. Such a genealogical account of Nietzsche’s historiography would be severely unwieldy, if not impossible. It nevertheless serves to mention at least two of the most prominent lines of the interpretive reception of Nietzsche’s meta-history.

Although a broad generalization, continental thinkers from the 1930’s to the 1970’s such as Heidegger, Jaspers, Sartre, Arendt, Levinas, Ricouer and Patočka took their cue from Nietzsche’s demand that the human person be considered within the framework of his or her historicity. Specifically, they each appear influenced by Nietzsche’s 1874 characterization of the human animal as the one unable to ignore his or her temporality; being human means being forever tied to a continual process of becoming, the awareness of which it is our unique burden to bear (UB II 1, KSA 1, 248f). In fact, this single idea is arguably the most essential and unifying theme among all mid-20th Century continental thinkers. One must understand her existential condition as oriented in her birth and propelled toward her future possibilities, which fall under the inescapable common horizon of death. Orienting oneself to one’s history becomes the essential existential project.

Among later postmodern continental thinkers such as Foucault, DeMan, Lacoue-Labarthes, Lyotard, Derrida, and among the most noted contemporary postmodern meta-historians like Hayden White, Frank Ankersmit, and Keith Jenkins, the anthropological focus increasingly shifts to an epistemological one. The view of history as a mirror of the real events of a real objective past is ridiculed as an outdated conservative ideal. Historiography has historically not been used to discover truth, pure and unadulterated—and indeed cannot be. Historical writing hitherto has consisted in a set of authoritative narratives constructed in order to justify existing biases and power structures. Consistent with their interpretation of Nietzsche’s genealogical project, they see the West in a moment of cultural crisis, one which historiography has uncovered and which it must of itself help resolve. Historiography’s task is thus no longer to simply records facts, they hold, but to unmask the so-called ‘objective’ systems of values by deconstructing or revealing as mythic the ideological foundations on which they were built. After those grand-narratives have been exposed, historiography’s myth-making capacities are to be refocused to allow previously underrepresented groups to construct the story from their own perspectives. One senses here the rather freely-interpreted application of Nietzsche’s claim that “the more eyes, different eyes we learn to set upon the same object, the more complete will be our ‘concept’ of this thing, the more ‘objective’” (GM III 12, KSA 5, 365), but they are nevertheless correct to acknowledge the debt their own conception of power-interpretation owes to Nietzsche.

7. References and Further Reading

  • BAW: Historisch-kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, 5 vols., edited by Joachim Mette et al. (Berlin, 1933–43).
  • KGB: Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Briefwechsel, edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1975ff).
  • KGW: Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1967ff).
  • KSA: Sämtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe, 15 vols., edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1988).
  • KSB: Sämtliche Briefe: Kritische Studienausgabe, 8 vols., edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1986).

a. References

  • Born, Marcus Andreas, Nihilistisches Geschichtsdenken: Nietzsches perspektivische Genealogie (München: Wilhelm Fink, 2010).
  • Burckhardt, Jakob, Gesamtausgabe in 14 Bände, edited by Emil Dürr et al. (Stuttgart/Berlin/Leipzig: Deutsche Verlaganstalt, 1930-4).
  • Durkheim, Émile, Selected Writings, edited by Anthony Giddens (Cambridge (Cambridge University Press, 1972).
  • Gay, Peter, Style in History: Gibbon, Ranke, Macaulay, Burckhardt (New York /London: W.W. Norton, 1974).
  • Hartmann, Eduard von, Philosophie des UnbewusstenSpeculative Resultate nach inductiv-naturwissenschaftlicher Methode in 3 Bände (Leipzig: Kröner, 1923).
  • Janz, Curt Paul, Friedrich Nietzsche. Biographie in drei Bände (Munich: Carl Hanser, 1993).
  • Johnson, Dirk R., Nietzsche’s Anti-Darwinism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010).
  • Marx, Karl & Engels, Friedrich, The German Ideology, translated by S. Ryazanskaya (New York: Prometheus, 1998).
  • Richardson, John, Nietzsche's New Darwinism (New York/Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004).
  • Rickert, Heinrich, Science and History: Critique of Positivist Epistemology, translated by G. Reisman (New York: Van Nostrand, 1962).
  • Schopenhauer, Arthur, Zürcher Ausgabe. Werke in zehn Bände, edited by Hübscher et al. (Zürich: Diogenes Verlag, 1977).
  • Wilamowitz-Moellendorff, Ulirch von, “Future Philology! A Reply to Friedrich Nietzsche’s ‘The Birth of Tragedy’,” translated by Gertrude Postl et al., New Nietzsche Studies 4[1] (2000): 1-32.
  • Windelband, William, An Introduction to Philosophy, translated by J. McCabe (London: Unwin, 1921).
  • Windelband, William, “History and Natural Science,” translated by G. Oakes, History and Theory 19[2] (1980): 165-85.

b. Further Reading

  • Bahnsen, Julius, Zur Philosophie der Geschichte: Eine kritische Besprechung des Hegel-Hartmann’sche Evolutionismus aus Schopenhauer’schen Principien (Berlin: Duncker, 1872).
    • One of Nietzsche’s principle sources for both his criticism of teleology and his formulation of a naturalistic theory of historical explanation.
  • Benne, Christian, Nietzsche und die historisch-kritische Philologie (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2005)
    • Exposits and analyzes the way Nietzsche’s early philological training enters his mature philosophical thinking.
  • Bernoulli, Carl Albrecht, Das Dreigestirn: Bachofen, Jakob Burckhardt, Nietzsche (Basel: Schwabe & Co., 1931).
    • A reliable and comprehensive account of the personal and intellectual interrelations of these three Basel professors.
  • Blondel, Éric, The Body and Culture: Philosophy as Philological Genealogy, translated by Sean Hand (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1991).
    • Highly insightful attempt to assimilate Nietzsche’s philological training with a postmodern account of his perspectivism.
  • Born, Marcus Andreas, Nihilistisches Geschichtsdenken: Nietzsches perspektivische Genealogie (München: Wilhelm Fink, 2010).
    • A Foucault-influenced account of Nietzsche’s critique of Hegelian teleology and the historical ramifications of the death of God.
  • Brobjer, Thomas H. (2004): “Nietzsche’s View of the Value of Historical Studies and Methods” In: Journal of the History of Ideas. Bd. 65 (2), 301-22.
  • Brobjer, Thomas H., “Nietzsche’s Relation to Historical Methods and Nineteenth-Century German Historiography,” History and Theory 46 (2007): 155–79.
    • Both pieces by Brobjer present a wealth of information about Nietzsche’s historiographical context, reading, and influences.
  • Campioni, Guiliano, Paolo D’Iorio, Maria Cristina Fornari, Francesco Fronterotta & Andrea Orsucci (eds.) (2003): Nietzsches persönliche Bibliothek. Berlin (Walter de Gruyter Press).
    • A comprehensive collection of Nietzsche’s personal library, essential for reconstructing what Nietzsche read about history and historoical theory.
  • Cancik, Hubert, Nietzsches Antike: Vorlesung (Stuttgart: J.B. Metzler Verlag, 1995).
    • An examination of Nietzsche’s philological activities from one of the world’s leading historians of philology.
  • Dries, Manuel (ed.), Nietzsche on Time and History (Berlin: De Gruyter Press, 2008).
    • A fine collection of essays from leading and upcoming scholars, many of which address Nietzsche’s thinking about history.
  • Drossbach, Maximillian, Über scheinbaren und wirklichen Ursachen des Geschehens in der Welt (Halle: Pfeffer, 1884).
    • A naturalistic rejection of teleological historical explanation that Nietzsche read shortly before the composition of On the Genealogy of Morals.
  • Emden, Christian, Friedrich Nietzsche and the Politics of History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008).
    • A highly-informative contextualized account of Nietzsche’s historical theory, with special reference to the culture and politics of Basel during Nietzsche’s tenure.
  • Geuss, Raymond, “Nietzsche and Genealogy,” European Journal of Philosophy 2 (1994): 275–92.
    • An especially clear account of Nietzsche’s explanatory strategies in the Genealogy of Morals.
  • Gossman, Lionel, Basel in the Age of Burckhardt: A Study in Unseasonable Ideas (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000).
  • A foundational account of Nietzsche’s intellectual milieu in the 1860’s-70’s.
  • Hartmann, Eduard von, Philosophie des Unbewussten: Speculative Resultate nach inductiv-naturwissenschaftlicher Methode (Berlin: Carl Duncker, 1869).
    • One of Nietzsche’s most important sources of teleological historiography and the main target of his ire in the second Untimely Meditation.
  • Jensen, Anthony K., Nietzsche’s Philosophy of History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013).
    • A comprehensive account of Nietzsche’s historical theory and its shifts over the course of his career.
  • Jensen, Anthony K. & Heit, Helmut (eds.), Nietzsche as a Scholar of Antiquity (New York / London: Bloomsbury Publishing, 2014).
    • A collection of articles that covers the scope of Nietzsche’s publications and lecture notes during his time as a classical philologist.
  • Lipperheide, Christian, Nietzsches Geschichtsstrategien. Die rhetorische Neuorganisation der Geschichte (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1999).
    • A narrativist and constructivist reading of Nietzsche’s philosophy of history.
  • Meyer, Katrin, Ästhetik der Historie: Friedrich Nietzsches ‘vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben’ (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1998).
    • An analysis of the second Untimely Meditation from the perspective of Nietzsche’s aesthetic theory.
  • Nehamas, Alexander, “The Genealogy of Genealogy: Interpretation in Nietzsche’s Second Untimely Meditation and in On the Genealogy of Morals,” in Nietzsche, Genealogy, and Morality, edited by Richard Schacht (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1994), 269–83.
    • Considers Nietzsche’s genealogical mode of philosophizing as a more elaborate but nevertheless consistent expression of his earlier philological methodology.
  • Pletsch, Carl, Young Nietzsche: Becoming a Genius (New York: The Free Press, 1991).
    • An intellectual biography of Nietzsche’s early years, with special attention to his schooling and time at Basel.
  • Porter, James I., Nietzsche and the Philology of the Future (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000).
    • Remains the decisive account of Nietzsche’s philological study, articles, and lectures.
  • Reinhardt, Karl, “Nietzsche und die Geschichte,” in his Vermächtnis der Antike. Gesammelte Essays zur Philosophie und Geschichtsschreibung (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1960), 296–309.
    • A dated, but still informative critique of Nietzsche’s contribution to philology from one of the leading classicists of the 20th Century.
  • Ritschl, Friedrich, Opuscula Philologica, 5 vols., edited by Kurt Wachsmuth (Leipzig: Teubner, 1879).
    • The badly-neglected collected works of Nietzsche’s teacher, containing, among many other things, observations and exhortations about the contemporary practice of classical philology as Nietzsche would have known them.
  • Saar, Martin, Genealogie als Kritik: Geschichte und Theorie des Subjekts nach Nietzsche und Foucault (Frankfurt/New York: Campus Verlag, 2007).
    • An admirable attempt to compare the historical theories of Foucault and Nietzsche from the standpoint of their respective notions of subjectivity.
  • Salaquarda, Jörg, “Studien zur Zweiten Unzeitgemäßen Betrachtung,” Nietzsche-Studien 13 (1984): 1–45.
    • The most comprehensive account of the genesis and context of the second Untimely Meditation in any language.
  • Schrift, Alan, Nietzsche and the Question of Interpretation: Between Hermeneutics and Deconstruction (New York/London: Routledge, 1990).
    • A decisive continental treatment of Nietzsche’s thinking generally, with special attention to Nietzsche’s theory of historical interpretation.
  • Sommer, Andreas Urs, Der Geist der Historie und das Ende des Christentums. Zur „Waffengenossenschaft“ von Friedrich Nietzsche und Franz Overbeck (Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1997).
    • A highly-informed comparison of Nietzsche and the theological historian Franz Overbeck concerning especially teleology and Christian historiography.
  • Stambaugh, Joan, The Problem of Time in Nietzsche, translated by John F. Humphrey (Philadelphia: Bucknell University Press, 1987).
    • A seminal examination of the interrelation of history, temporality, subjectivity, and willing in Nietzsche.
  • White, Hayden, Metahistory: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-Century Europe (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1973).
    • Includes an attempt to read Nietzsche as a precursor to post-modern historical narrativity. White is one of the leading philosophers of history in the world.

 

Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
Email: Anthony.Jensen@providence.edu
Providence College
U. S. A.

Mulla Sadra (c. 1572—1640)

Mulla Sadra made major contributions to Islamic metaphysics and to Shi'i theology during the Safavid period (1501-1736) in Persia. He started his career in the context of a rising culture that combined elements from the Persian past with the newly institutionalized Shi'ism and Sufi teachings. Mulla Sadra was heir to a long tradition of Islamic philosophy that from the beginning had accommodated the speculations of Greek philosophers, especially Neoplatonic philosophers, for the purpose of understanding the world, particularly in relation to the creator and the Islamic faith. Islamic philosophy originated in the rational endeavours to reconcile reason and revelation though the results did not always satisfy theologians, but ironically widened the gaps between reason and revelation.

Mulla Sadra, too, was deeply concerned about both reason and revelation, and he tried a new way of reconciliation by openly employing a synthetic methodology in which mysticism played an important part. For him and his followers, human knowledge is tenable only as long as it goes back to the indirect grasp of reality which in itself is not subject to conceptualization.  Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra was dedicated to the traditional forms of logical arguments that are based on premises evident to the mind rather than on beliefs which come from religious faith and tradition. For example, his use of Qur'anic verses and religious ideas, though it is an important part of his system, is mainly confined to a secondary or supportive position. As for mysticism, the extensive use of mystical concepts and terminology is acceptable from the point of view of those thinkers who believe that mystical inspiration, intellectual intuition, and revelation, originate in one and the same source, hence their celebration of Mulla Sadra's work as "prophetic philosophy." As a result, the scope of Mulla Sadra's work is wider than his predecessors. In addition to metaphysics, he wrote extensively on the Qur'an and the Tradition and no other major philosopher before him had been so productive in the field of religion.

While focusing on Mulla Sadra's metaphysics including his ontology, epistemology, psychology, this article also brings to light the philosopher's solutions to theological problems. Owing to these solutions, not only did Islamic philosophy manage to survive against religious and political odds, but also Shi'i theology never lost its foothold on the intellectual ground. Although the organic unity of Mulla Sadra's system rests on all the various components of his thought, his independent works on exegesis, mystical treatises, and his commentaries on preceding philosophers, are outside the scope of this article.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Synthetic methodology
  3. Ontology
    1. Primacy of Being
    2. Gradation of Being
    3. The Absolute and the Relational
  4. Epistemology
    1. Mental Being
    2. Unity of the Knower and the Known
  5. Soteriological Psychology
    1. Substantial Motion and the Soul
    2. The End of the Human Soul
  6. Major Theological Issues
    1. The Essence and the Attributes
    2. Temporal Origin of the World
    3. Bodily Resurrection
    4. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood
  7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition
  8. Legacy
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Philosophical Works
    2. English Translation of Primary Literature
    3. Secondary Books in European Languages

1. Biography

Muhammad ibn Ibrahim ibn Yahya al-Qawami al-Shirazi, commonly known as Mulla Sadra, was born and grew up during the golden days of the Safavid period, Iran’s first Shi'ite dynasty (c. 1501-1736). As the only son of a noble family, he received both intellectual and financial support towards a good education that started in his home town, Shiraz, in southeastern Iran. Though Shiraz had a glorious past with regard to philosophy, in Mulla Sadra's day it was not the best place for satisfying his intellectual desire.  In his quest for advanced religious and philosophical training he left Shiraz for Qazvin and then moved to Isfahan where he studied with the most eminent intellectual figures of the day, Mir Damad (d. 1631) and Shaykh Baha'̓i (d. 1576) who were also affiliated with the court of the Safavid King, Shah Abbas I (c. 1587-1629). While Mulla Sadra's philosophical character evolved in conversation and debates with Mir Damad, he owed to Shayk Baha'i his broad knowledge of exegesis (tafsir), tradition (hadith), mysticism (irfan) and jurisprudence (fiqh).  There is yet no historical evidence that he ever studied with Mir Findiriski (d. 1640/1), the other leading intellectual of the time. However, the frequency of associating the two by scholars such as Henry Corbin (d. 1978) suggests an inclination on their part towards providing a perfect picture of the philosopher's integration in the intellectual life of Isfahan with all the pivotal thinkers involved in shaping what has been called "the full flowering of prophetic philosophy" in Mulla Sadra's hands (Nasr 2006).

In 1601, upon the death of his father, Mulla Sadra returned to Shiraz. Later he related his experience during the time spent in Shiraz in a doleful and critical voice denouncing the intellectual atmosphere of the city for being hostile, suppressive, and philistine with regard to philosophy (al-Asfar I 7). He decided to leave Shiraz for a life of solitude and contemplation in Kahak, a quiet village near the city of Qom. The peace and quiet of life in Kahak gave Mulla Sadra the opportunity to start the composition of his most foundational work, al-Hikmat al-muta 'aliya fi'l-asfar al-'aqliyya al-arba (Transcendent Wisdom in the Four Journeys of the Intellect). There he also found some of his life-long students who became well-known scholars of their own time.

This period was followed by several journeys between Shiraz, Isfahan, Qom, Kashan, and most importantly, seven pilgrimages to Mecca. Apparently, this itinerant stage played an important part in his intellectual and spiritual growth that is also suggested by the "journey" metaphor in the title and divisions of al-Asfar. It was also during this period that Mulla Sadra accepted the invitation to teach at Khan School, which was built in Shiraz on the order of the new governor, Allahwirdi Khan, in Mulla Sadra's honour and for the purpose of his lectures.

Mulla Sadra had a family of six children, three sons and three daughters. All his sons became scholars and his daughters were married to three of Sadra's students whom he treated as family even prior to the marriages. We know that two of these students Muhsin Fayz Kashani  (d. 1679/80 ) and Abd al-Razzaq Lahiji (d. 1661/2 ) succeeded their father-in-law as two influential figures of their time though different to him in their philosophical orientation and working under more pressure due to the growing antagonism to philosophy and mysticism under Shah Abbas II (c. 1642-1666).

The intellectual network consisting of Mulla Sadra, his teachers and students that was later dubbed "the School of Isfahan" was formed in a unique political and religious context. Philosophers such as Mir Damad and Mulla Sadra managed to get their voices heard by their contemporaries and posterities in spite of the conservative religiosity of the newly established Shi'ite rule partly owing to the religious and political state of affairs. Since the Safavids strove to establish their identity as a Persian-Shi'ite state in contrast to the Sunni caliphate of the Turks and Arabs, they were in need of philosophy as a stronghold of knowledge that could reinforce, not to say generate, power through systematic thought. At least during the formative and golden days of the Safavid period the attacks on philosophers targeted their Sufi leanings rather than their endeavours to reconcile metaphysics with Shi'ite theology.

A prolific writer, Mulla Sadra composed a large number of treatises on ontology, epistemology, cosmology, psychology, eschatology, theology, mysticism, the Quran and the Tradition. However, many of his philosophical and theological works are repetitions of or elaborations on chapters from his magnum opus al-Hikmat al-mutaliyah fi’l-asfar al-arba‘a al-‘aqliyyah, commonly referred to as al-Asfar that is printed in nine volumes. Rather than simply holding Mulla Sadra's theses, the latter work is an encyclopaedia of different schools of Islamic philosophy and theology. With the exception of Risala-yi si asl (Treatise on the Three Principles) which is in Persian, he wrote all his works in Arabic that was the lingua franca of the Muslim world at that time. He also wrote extensive commentaries on the Qur 'an and the tradition among which respectively al-Mafatihal-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible) and his voluminous commentary on the famous collection of Shi'ite tradition, Usul al-kafi by Kulayni (d.939) are the most important.

After a pious life of dedication to acquiring and expanding philosophy and Islamic sciences, Mulla Sadra died in Basra on the way to his seventh pilgrimage to Mecca. His death was once believed to have occurred in 1640 with his body being buried in Basra. However,  modern scholarship offers new evidence, though not conclusive evidence, in support of the date of 1645 and his burial being in Najaf (Rizvi 2007 30).

2. Synthetic methodology

Mulla Sadra was determined to construct a spacious house of "transcendental philosophy" that could accommodate the apparently conflicting paths in Islamic history towards the ultimate wisdom. He was also heir to a long tradition of philosophy in Persia which had adopted the methodology of Greek philosophy and interpreted it not only in accordance with the Islamic faith, but also implicitly and partly in continuation of the antique Persian traditions. Similar to his past philosophical masters Ibn Sina (d. 1037) and Suhrawardi (d. 1191), but unaware of Ibn Rushd's (d.1198) criticism of Neoplatonism in Islamic philosophy, Mulla Sadra relied on Neoplatonic precepts which had been taken for Aristotelian ideas by preceding philosophers. In particular, he followed Suhrawardi by adopting a holistic method of philosophy in which reason is accompanied by intuition, and intellection is the realization of the quintessence of the human soul, with prophecy (nubuwwa) and sainthood (wilaya) as the noblest manifestations of it.  It is based on this holistic attitude that on the one hand, Mulla Sadra synthesizes the two main schools of Islamic philosophy, namely, the Peripatetic and Illuminationist schools, and on the other hand, bridges the gaps between philosophy, theology, and mysticism. While Mulla Sadra's philosophical methodology is rational in the sense of building his arguments on premises that consist in evident propositional beliefs, he does not reduce philosophical process to mere abstract logical reasoning. The pivotal place of intuition in his philosophical methodology is especially reflected by the influence of Ibn Arabi (d. 1240) throughout his works and by the fact that he regarded Ibn Arabi's writings as having a philosophical character with a "demonstrative force" (al-Asfar I 315). Whether we understand Mulla Sadra's use of intuition as "a higher form of reason" in the Platonic sense (Rahman 1975, 6), or as a prophetic experience that turns philosophy into "theosophy" (Nasr 1997, 57), in reality there is no actual separation between reason and intuition in Mulla Sadra's philosophy. Rather than considering ratiocination (that is, the process of exact thinking) and intuition as independent ways leading to different visions of the truth, for him they merge into one path complementing and completing each other.

Although no Islamic philosopher had ever announced reason and revelation, philosophy and prophecy in conflict with each other, in practice, several philosophical doctrines were regarded by theologians as blasphemous due to contradiction with the theological formulations of Quranic teachings. By synthesizing the findings of his predecessors and relying on his holistic methodology, Mulla Sadra addressed several controversial issues that had opened a wide gap between philosophy and theology, reason and faith. His conciliatory attitude is manifest in his writings that are replete with scriptural and theological references alongside and in harmony with the teachings of Ibn Sina, Suhrawardi, Ibn Arabi, and other Muslim thinkers.

3. Ontology

a. Primacy of Being

Although Aristotle identifies the external existence of a thing with its primary substance, he distinguishes between two questions we can ask with respect to everything: "What it is" and "whether it is (or exists)". This conceptual distinction was later extended to the extra-mental realm of contingent beings by Islamic philosophers, most insistently Ibn Sina, and following him scholastic philosophers such as Aquinas (d. 1274). For Ibn Sina, essence, or quiddity (mahiyya), is universal in the mind while particular in the external world once being is bestowed on it by the Necessary Being who is identified with the God of Abrahamic faith. Except for God who exists in His own right, every other being is composed of essence and being, hence contingent in the sense of dependence on the Necessary Being for their existence.

The distinction was taken for granted after Ibn Sina but turned into a controversial issue when philosophers in the Illuminationist school questioned the external reality of being over and above essence. Suhrawardi and following him Mir Damad argued that being was only a mental construct and the distinction between essence and being was only possible in the conceptual domain. Since then, Islamic philosophers have roughly been categorized as adherents of either the primacy of essence or the primacy of being. Influenced by his philosophy master, Mulla Sadra started as an advocate of essentialism but soon diverged towards the opposite doctrine that he made famous as "the primacy of being" (asalat-i wujud). He built on this foundation the whole of his philosophical system.

Starting with the concept of being, Mulla Sadra attributes two major characteristics to it. Firstly, being is beyond logical analysis, hence indefinable, due to its simplicity and supra-categorical status. It is self-evident and prior to any other concept in the mind. Secondly, it is a univocal concept in the sense that it has one and the same meaning in all its applications, whether we apply it to God or to any other entity. The first characteristic seems to place being as such totally outside the grasp of discursive thought. The second one leaves the philosopher with the hope that in case he finds an alternative path towards being, he will be able to bridge the ontological gap made by certain theologians between the Creator and the created.

As for the reality of being in the external world, Mulla Sadra not only follows Ibn Sina in considering being as a reality, but adheres to his other master, Ibn'Arabi in considering being as the only reality, the doctrine which is commonly referred to as "the unity of being" (wahdat al-wujud). Nevertheless, Mulla Sadra's ontological monism does not imply that essences are illusions, as it is held in radical forms of Sufism. For Mulla Sadra, though essences are not genuine in their existence, they still exist as delimitations of the Real Being that is the ground of all that exists. Using a poetic analogy, the indefinite Reality is a colorless light while essences are the colourful glasses through which the single light appears as diverse phenomena. Conceptual differentiation, without which thinking and speaking would be impossible, is owing to this semi-reality of essences. To sum up, while being is the principle of unity, essence or quiddity is the principle of difference.

Mulla Sadra has several arguments for the primacy of being and its unrivalled reality. The most comprehensive list of the arguments appears in his al-Mashair, a useful summary of his ontology, and several arguments are included in al-Asfar. For the premises of his arguments, Mulla Sadra relies on the classical understanding of essence as a universal without external effects within the mind. On this ground, the real horse can give you a ride while the universal horse in the mind is incapable of that because real particularity, external properties and real effects are owing to being and cannot be in the mind. In conclusion, being is the ground of reality, or better to say, reality itself, while essence only belongs to the conceptual realm and as Mulla Sadra put it "the term 'existent' is applied to essence only with respect to its relation to being [itself]" (al-Asfar VI 163).

b. Gradation of Being

The univocal concept of being applies to its instances in the same sense because of the unity of its reality, and conceptual differences are only due to essences. On the other hand, essences have no reality of their own. Based on these two premises, one could conclude that diversity is not real. Gradation, or modulation, of being (tashkik al-wujud) is Mulla Sadra's way to avoid this counterintuitive result and to create a system in which the monistic worldview of Sufism is reconciled with the realistic pluralism of classical philosophy and our common sense. According to this doctrine, though one simple reality, being comes in grades, in a similar way that sunlight and candlelight are the same reality of different grades. In effect, there are only differences by degrees, while essences, as concepts in the mind, reflect gradations as contrasts. As Mulla Sadra put it,

The instances of being are different in terms of intensity and weakness as such, priority and posteriority as such; nobility and baseness as such, although the universal concepts applicable to it and abstracted from it, named quiddities, are in contrast essentially, in terms of genus, species, or accidents. (al-Asfar IX 186)

Before Mulla Sadra, Suhrawardi introduced the concept of gradation into the logic of definition and considered essence as capable of applying to instances by different degrees. For example, he regarded a horse more of an animal than a fly. His ontology was based on light as the hierarchical reality of universe with realms of existence as different ranks of it. Inspired by Suhrawardi's challenge of classical philosophers such as Ibn Sina who would not allow gradation in the same essence, but in contrast to the former's belief in the ontological primacy of essence or quiddity, Mulla Sadra replaced the hierarchical light of Suhrawardi with the hierarchical being. Accordingly, Reality is one and the same thing but possessed of different degrees of intensity, which justifies diversity within unity.

The doctrine of gradation not only supports the reality of diversity, but also points out the all-encompassing simplicity of being qua being. Hence the famous dictum that is frequently repeated in Mulla Sadra's works, "the Simple Reality (basit al-haqiqa) is all things but none of those things in particular" (al-Asfar VI 111).

c. The Absolute and the Relational

Given that for Mulla Sadra reality consists in different grades of the same being, the nature of causality becomes an urgent question for him. Mulla Sadra's formulation of causality reveals the strong influence of Ibn Arabi's unity of being (wahdat al-wujud). Mulla Sadra begins with causality in the sense of existentiation (ijad) according to which contingent essences are brought into existence once their existence is necessitated by the Necessary Being. However, since in Mulla Sadra's system, essences only belong in the conceptual domain, the relationship between cause and effect cannot be explained based on the metaphysical duality of being/essence. Therefore, he finally replaces this duality by the distinction he makes between two senses of being, the independent and the relational. At the cosmic level, the only independent being is the Absolute Being, while the rest, no matter of what intensity, are only relational.

Mulla Sadra's introduction of this distinction into Islamic philosophy was inspired by the linguistic division between the meaning of "to be" in the sense of existence as a real predicate, and "to be" as a copula, the latter being nonexistent as a word in Arabic and only suggested though predication. Relational being is a "being-in-another" in the sense of being nothing other than a relation to another being. For example, in saying that "snow is white", the predicative relation that is expressed by "is" has no existence apart from "snow" and "white". Mulla Sadra regards all beings as nothing but an existential relation to the Absolute Being. For Him, "He is the Truth and the rest are His manifestations. He is the Light and the rest are the streaks of that Light…" (al-Masha’ir 450).

4. Epistemology

Mulla Sadra's epistemology is not prior to but based on his findings about the nature of reality. Though this may sound like begging the question from the perspective of modern philosophy, it is consistent with the totality of Mulla Sadra's system in which everything including knowledge itself is a form of being. It is for this reason that he studies knowledge as a subject of first philosophy, namely, the study of being qua being. He diverges from what he criticises in Ibn Sina as the negative process of abstraction (al-Asfar III 287) in favour of the positive presence of noetic or mental beings in the mind. For Mulla Sadra, knowledge is the realization of an immaterial being which corresponds to the extra-mental reality because it is the higher grade of the latter being.

Mulla Sadra's main contribution to Islamic epistemology lies in his diversion from the Aristotelian dualism of subject and object, in other words, knower and the known (̒aqil wa ma'quil). He rejected the dominant theory of knowledge as the representation of the abstracted and universal form of particular objects to the mind. This innovation, though on a different ground and based on a different foundation, is comparable to the 20th century efforts made in the area of phenomenology and existentialism to get over the epistemological scepticism resulting from Cartesian dualism.

a. Mental Being

In classical Islamic epistemology knowledge is divided into "knowledge by presence" that consists only in the immediate access of the soul to itself in the sense of self-consciousness, and "knowledge by acquisition" that originates in sense perception and provides the subject with an abstracted representation of the external objects, that is, the intelligible universal at the level of intellect. In line with the Neoplatonic trend of thought adopted by Suhrawardi, Mulla Sadra replaced representation by direct presentation (hudur). For Mulla Sadra, all knowledge is, at bottom, knowledge by presence because our knowledge of the world is a direct access to what is called mental beings.

In contrast to the Peripatetic mental form or concept as a universal produced by abstraction, mental being is an immaterial and particular mode of existence with a higher intensity than the external object corresponding to it. According to Mulla Sadra, mental being is the key to the realization of all levels of knowledge including sense perception, imagination, and intellection. Upon encounter with the external world, the soul creates mental beings in a similar manner that God creates the world of substantial forms both material and immaterial (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 43). Thus, rather than correspondence between the external object and its represented form in the mind, for Mulla Sadra the credibility of knowledge lies in the existential unity of  different grades of the same being, one created by the soul and the other existing in the external world.

Although the human soul has the potentiality of creating modes of existence also in the absence of the matter, as in the case of miracles, for the average human soul, as long as she lives in the material world, contact with matter is necessary for activating the creative process of generating mental beings. In this respect, Mulla Sadra's epistemology should not be conflated with subjective idealism in that for him the physical being is a reality though of a lesser intensity than its counterpart in the soul.

b. Unity of the Knower and the Known

Mulla Sadra revolutionized epistemology with regard to the relationship between the knowing subject and her object based on the doctrine of the unity of the knower and the known previously held by the Neoplatonic Porphyry (d. 305) but strongly rejected by Ibn Sina.  Siding with the former, Mulla Sadra redefines the status of knowledge. Previously, mental form was defined as a psychic quality that occurs to the immaterial substance of the soul as a mere accident (̒arad), incapable of making any changes to the soul's essence. Conversely, for Mulla Sadra, knowledge that is made up of mental beings functions as a substantial form that actualizes the potential faculties of the soul. Similar to form and matter in the physical world, there is no real separation between the knower (soul or mind) and the immediately known object of it, that is, the mental being. To put it in a nutshell, knowledge is a single reality that, in its potentiality, is called "the knower" ('lim) or "the intellect" ('aqil) while in its actuality, it is "the known" (ma'lum) or the "intelligible" (ma'quil). Owing to this unity, rather than being a fixed substratum for accidental mental forms, the mind in its reality is identical to the sum of all the mental beings that are realized in it. In other words, there is no such thing as an actual mind in the absence of knowledge.

This existential unification holds at all the levels of knowledge that is confined by Mulla Sadra to sense perception, imagination, and intellection. The faculty of sense perception is a potentiality of the soul that is unified with the perceptible forms (or beings) in the occasion of contact with the sensible world. Once sensible forms (beings) are realized, a higher grade of mental beings called "the imaginal beings" are actualized in unity with the imaginative faculty of the soul. The same unification holds at the level of intellection between the intelligible forms (beings) as the actual and the intellect as potential. From this level, the human soul is capable of acquiring higher degrees of knowledge that prepares her for the final unification with the Active Intellect that is the reservoir of all knowledge, and as a result, the activator of the human mind during the creative process of knowledge formation. This epistemic elevation is at the same time the journey of the soul towards higher grades of being and spiritualization.

5. Soteriological Psychology

In the pre-modern context, one should understand the term "psychology" in the sense of inquiry into the nature and mechanism of the metaphysical soul in its relation to the body. Moreover, informed by the Islamic doctrines and inspired by mysticism, Islamic philosophers regarded the human soul as capable of elevation through acquiring knowledge and spiritual practice. Mulla Sadra's psychology is not an exception to this tradition; however, in his system, the human soul is given a more dominant role within the cosmic drama that unfolds along a salvific process of perfection.

a. Substantial Motion and the Soul

Mulla Sadra describes the soul as one simple but graded reality that in its unity includes diverse mental faculties. He also regards the soul as bodily in its origin, but spiritual in subsistence. This picture of the soul's substance is unprecedented in the philosophy before Mulla Sadra. It is built on the doctrine of substantial motion that is one of the hallmarks of transcendental philosophy. According to this doctrine, all nature, including substances and accidents, is in motion. As bodily in its origin, the soul too moves from one form to another as long as it is living in this world. The substance of the soul is an existentially graded reality in which the changes take place through the superimposition of one form over the previous one rather than one replacing the other. Therefore, the unity of the soul is maintained despite the changes and her identity is preserved.

Though starting from the Aristotelian view of the soul as the form of the body, in his psychology, Mulla Sadra departs from the former in attributing to the human soul the power of growing out of the bodily attachment. Along with the expansion of knowledge and spiritual evolvement, the soul moves up to higher grades of being. The rational human soul is actualized when we reach maturity (around the age of forty), but this is not the end. At this stage, we are actually human but potentially angels or devils. 

b. The End of the Human Soul

For Mulla Sadra, the ultimate happiness of the human souls is to join in the beatific life of the Intellects. This is in agreement not only with Aristotle's definition of happiness, but also with a Neoplatonic doctrine according to which the individual souls are only particular determinations of the universal soul that descends to the imperfect level of nature by joining the bodies. Therefore, the individual human soul, though starting as a bodily being in the world, is still invested with an otherworldly spirituality due to the noble state of the universal soul before the descent. The inherent inclination toward reunion with the Active Intellect, that is, the realm of Divine Knowledge, puts the soul back on the "arch of ascent". However, the ascent toward reunion is not guaranteed for each and every human soul since there are many phases that each soul should pass successfully in order to substantially evolve and reach up to higher ranks of being.

Mulla Sadra's delineation of the soul's journey resonates with ideas of Islamic mysticism which in turn is indebted for its theoretical formulation to Neoplatonic ideas. The title of his magnum opus, al-Asfar, together with its main divisions is a proof to the mystical attachment as the philosophical narrative unfolds in terms of the famous four journeys of the soul, namely, the quest in search of the ultimate Truth or God and the final reunion with Him. In al-Asfar, the first journey that is from the created to the Creator is devoted to the concept and reality of being. The second journey is from the Creator to the Creator through the Creator, and discusses essence. The third journey is from the Creator to the created with the Creator and is about God and His Attributes, and finally the journey from the created to the created with the Creator that is focused on the destiny of the humankind.

Furthermore, Mulla Sadra explains the afterlife of the human soul based on Ibn'Arabi's metaphysics of imagination that introduces the imaginal world (̒alam al-mithal) in between the Intellectual realm on top and the material world at the bottom. In line with Ibn'Arabi and Suhrawardi, while in contrast to Ibn Sina, Mulla Sadra believes in a bipartite reality of imagination according to which imaginative forms can exist both as subjective, or attached to the human mind, and as objective, or independent, comprising the detached domain of imagination, that is, the imaginal world. The creative imagination of the human soul, which is the source of prophecy and miracles in this world, is also the key to the bodily resurrection of the soul in the next world. While in this world only the prophets and saints are capable of bringing their imagination into life, in the next world where the material bodies are no more existent, every soul will be capable of creating her imaginal body.

The bodily resurrection of the soul should not be conflated with any forms of reincarnation which is strongly rejected by Mulla Sadra. He uses the analogy of "reflections in the mirror" (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya, 126) to show the necessary correlation between the otherworldly body and the spiritual grade of the individual soul. Rather than transmigrating into another body, the soul creates its very own body that becomes an objective image of her intentions and deeds in the previous life. That is the reason why the lesser souls will be resurrected as animals while the noble ones will simply join in the life of Intellect with no bodies at all. Thus, the hierarchy of resurrected souls in the next world corresponds to the hierarchy of souls in this world. There is a subtle problem here concerning the nature of imagination and the "mirror-like" nature of the soul in terms of eschatology. Mulla Sadra's use of mirror imagery with respect to other-worldly bodies is his response to Suhrawardi on the same issue and draws on the endeavours of Ibn'Arabi and his commentator Dawoud al-Qaysari (d. 1350) to solve an earlier problem in Islamic philosophy (Rustom 2007).

6. Major Theological Issues

Islamic philosophy is rooted in the early endeavours of Mu'tazilite theologians who borrowed the instrument of Greek logic and terminology in order to formulate the doctrines of faith in a manner palatable for human reason. Of primary importance was proof to the existence and oneness of God, the nature and function of His Attributes, and the nature and mechanism of prophecy. Not only have different schools of theology offered divergent solutions to theological problems, but also theology has been in conflict with philosophy over several key issues. One of the novelties of Mulla Sadra's work was the systematic effort to resolve long-held conflicts between philosophers and theologians. Moreover, unlike his philosophical predecessors, he did not leave any religious doctrine to mere faith and believed in the possibility of rational explanation for all. His proof for the doctrine of bodily resurrection is a good example of this positive attitude. On the whole, Mulla Sadra does not see a chasm between philosophy and theology; rather, his theology is both the continuation and the ultimate result of his philosophical doctrines.

Mulla Sadra dismissed all the previous proofs to the existence of God as resting on wrong assumptions, or at best insufficient. He even criticised Ibn Sina's "proof of the righteous" (al-Asfar VI 13) because of its reliance on the concept rather than the reality of being. However, Mulla Sadra's proof, which he calls by the same name, shares the a priori character of Ibn Sina's proof. An a priori proof (burhan-i limmi) does not infer the existence of the Creator (cause) from the existence of any particular created thing (effect). For Mulla Sadra, the "proof of the righteous" is called by this name because it has the privilege of arguing for the existence of God through God Himself. Based on Mulla Sadra's ontology, the reality of being is necessary, and it is of different grades. The delimited and imperfect grades do not exist in their own right, but only as relations to the most perfect or Absolute Being. Therefore, the Absolute Being or God must necessarily exist. Starting from the reality of being, this argument infers the existence of God from God Himself because "the real being and the Necessary Being apply to the same thing", that is, God (al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma'ad 30).

As for the oneness of God (tawhid), that is, the first article of faith in Islam, Mulla Sadra further relies on his ontological views to argue against both the intrinsic and extrinsic plurality with respect to God. His argument is based on the transcendental inclusiveness of the Absolute Being. God as the Absolute Being is a simple reality in the sense of being without parts while including all things. As the most intense and the only independent being, God is inclusive of every form of existence while excluding only the imperfections and contingencies. Therefore, to assume another being next to God would be logically absurd. In Mulla Sadra, the theological doctrine of Divine Oneness can be identified with the mystical-philosophical doctrine of the oneness of being that is the only way in which the oneness of God can be understood without wrongly imagining it as a numerical concept.

a. The Essence and the Attributes

The simplicity of the Absolute Being in the sense of being comprehensive of all is also the key to explaining God's Attributes in relation to each other and to the Essence (dhat). Though the Attributes must be infinite in number and scope, human beings only know of a limited number of them through the Qur'an. The nature of Divine Attributes has been a subject of controversies between different theological schools. They differ over the objectivity of the Attributes in the sense of independence from God's Essence. In al-Asfar and al-Mabda’ wa’l-ma 'ad, Mulla Sadra has elaborated on several Attributes including Life, Knowledge, Will, Speech, Vision and Hearing. He tries to prove the reality of the Attributes in a way that would not defy the unity of God's Essence. He resolves this theological paradox of diversity in unity with regard to God's Essence by resorting to the simple reality of God's Being. In a similar way to the unity of the soul with the diverse psychic properties like knowledge and will, all the Attributes of God are not only unified with the Essence, but unified with each other. The corollary to this conclusion is that, in its ontological unity with the infinite and necessary Reality of God, each Attribute must be infinite and necessary. For example, God has necessary and infinite knowledge of all. According to Mulla Sadra, God knows the world through the knowledge of Himself and as his Essence includes all, he has knowledge of all without any limits. Nevertheless, the objects of divine knowledge exist at the level of Essence in a state of existential togetherness (wujud al-jam'i) with a higher grade of being than their existence as distinct essences in the created world. This is the way Mulla Sadra tried to resolve a long-held conflict between philosophy and theology regarding God's detailed knowledge of the world. In a similar fashion, Mulla Sadra redefines other Attributes of God in the context of transcendental philosophy with the hope of reconciling philosophy with theology.

b. Temporal Origin of the World

One of the earliest and harshest theological indictments of Islamic philosophy was carried out by the Ash'arite theologian, Abu Hamid Muhammad ibn Muhammad al-Ghazzali, (d. 1111) in his al-Tahafat al-falasifa (The Inconsistency of Philosophers). One of the most important faults he finds in philosophers such as Ibn Sina is the doctrine of the eternity of creation. According to this doctrine that was accepted by all Peripatetic philosophers the universe was created in eternity, which means that creation had no beginning in time. This doctrine has been criticised by theologians due to its conflict with the scriptural picture of creation, both in the Bible and the Qur'an.

Mulla Sadra takes a middle path between reason and revelation by resorting to his doctrine of substantial motion. According to Mulla Sadra, every particle of nature is in constant motion along their timeline which he regards as the fourth dimension of the bodily substance. Motion is not an accidental property given to nature over and above its substance; rather, it is essential to it and caused at the same 'time' with the creation of the bodily substance. Motion is by definition temporal, and substantial motion is the renewal of every particle of nature in time. Thus, Mulla Sadra concludes that every particle of nature is being recreated at every moment, which is the meaning of temporal origination. The world as a whole is nothing more than its parts, so the origination of the whole world in time is an absurd question.

c. Bodily Resurrection

Bodily resurrection is an article of Islamic faith that is regarded by theologians as a requisite for the fulfilment of the scriptural promises and threats regarding reward and punishment in the next world. As a theological issue, bodily resurrection has caused serious conflicts between philosophy and theology particularly following Ghazzali's criticism of Ibn Sina on this issue. According to Ibn Sina, bodily resurrection is a matter of faith that Muslims must believe in, but from a logical point of view, it is impossible.

Mulla Sadra follows Ghazzali in holding that scepticism over bodily resurrection is not acceptable from either the religious or logical point of view (al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya 125). However, he reinterprets bodily resurrection in terms of the imaginative creation of the otherworldly body by the soul. Though immaterial, the imaginal body is possessed of the three dimensions of the physical body that make it subject to a variety of feelings similar to our dream-world experiences. This will especially serve the purpose of punishment for the imperfect souls who spoiled the prospect of an intellectual/heavenly life through their carnal obsessions in the previous world. Some souls may be pardoned after serving their time in Hell by God's Grace and the intermission of angels and nobler souls. As for the others, they will stay in Hell with their imaginal bodies forever. Despite his efforts, Mulla Sadra's picture of resurrection is not in complete conformity with that of theology. Especially, his intellectual Paradise is not different to that of the classical philosophers. Great souls are not satisfied with carnal pleasures even in this world, so their reward in the next world cannot be a carnal one.

d. Prophethood, Imamate, and Sainthood

Influenced by Ibn 'Arabi's doctrine of "the Perfect Human" and its incorporation into Shi'i imamate by Sayyid Haydar Amuli  (d. 1385), Mulla Sadra explains prophethood, imamate, and sainthood as related aspects of the same reality. Prophets, Imams, and Saints are instances of the category of the Perfect Human (al-insan al-kamil) whose soul is inclusive of the three levels of creation, that is, the intellectual, the imaginal, and the sensory worlds. Mulla Sadra, regards prophethood as "exoteric guidance" (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 492) which is necessary for the average people. Intellectual truths that are revealed to prophets through the unification of their intellect with the Angel of revelation, identical to the Active Intellect of philosophy, descend to the level of imagination and sense perception in order to be communicated to the people.

The esoteric side of prophecy is not only the innermost spiritual meaning of it, but also the purpose of creation. Although Muslims believe that Muhammad was the last prophet of God, according to Mulla Sadra, after the death of Muhammad, revelation continued in the form of inspiration that endows the Imam and Saint with the same infallibility as the Prophet.  Thus, the content of the divine communication is the same in all three, but the form is slightly different. Prophets have a clearer vision of the Angel of revelation in comparison to the Imams and Saints (al-Shawahid al-rububiyya 480).

7. Commentaries on the Qur'an and Tradition

In many cases philosophers have resorted to the Qur’an in order to reinforce their philosophical arguments. On the other hand, there is a long tradition of Qur'anic exegesis ranging from technical linguistic analysis to rational and esoteric hermeneutics (ta'wῑl) that comprises a sophisticated and independent discipline. Mulla Sadra is a special case as a philosopher who has dedicated independent treatises to Qur'anic commentaries. Moreover, there is a mutual reinforcement between his philosophy and his reading of the Qur'an in the sense that not only his approach to the Qur'an is philosophical, but also his philosophy has a Qur’anic base (Rustom 2012). Mulla Sadra does not see any conflicts between the teachings of the Qur'an and his philosophical system. Apart from several commentaries on chapters and verses from the Qur'an, Mulla Sadra also wrote about the theoretical and practical criteria of exegesis. His major theoretical work is Mafatih al-ghayb (Keys to the Invisible).

As for Mulla Sadra's work on the tradition (hadith), his monumental commentary on al-Usul al-kafi by Kulayni  is the most important. Kulayni's work is the first Shi‘i collection of Hadith and focuses on theology and jurisprudence. It has served as a textbook at the religious seminaries around the Shi'i world for centuries, and Mulla Sadra's commentary on this work has secured him a good place among the experts in Hadith scholarship.

8. Legacy

Mulla Sadra's influence on his immediate students, including his sons-in-law, Fayz Kashani and Lahiji, owed more to the mystical aspect of his works. As for his philosophical doctrines, he was only followed by the less famous among his students such as Husayn Tunikabuni  (d.1693). Especially, in the late Safavid period due to the intellectually suppressive atmosphere created by influential clerics, most prominently Muhammad Baqir Majlisi (d. 1198), philosophical and particularly mystical thoughts were antagonized by the ruling system and the clerics alike.

Nevertheless, the legacy of the philosopher was kept alive until, in the Qajar period (c. 1785-1925), a more welcoming attitude facilitated the revival of his works in the hands of his followers who worked as Sadrian scholars. In addition to editing and expounding the latter's works, as teachers they also initiated a chain of scholars that has continued until today. Among contemporary scholars and Sadrian philosophers, Muhammad Husayn Tabataba'i (d. 1981) is one of the most widely read. His books, which are based on Mulla Sadra's philosophy with some modifications, are still being taught as compendiums of Islamic philosophy at the departments of philosophy in Iran. Mulla Sadra studies particularly flourished after the Islamic Revolution of 1979. Since then, he has been widely taught both at the religious seminaries and universities with governmental funds supporting the foundation of institutes and international conferences. Among these, Sadra Islamic Philosophy Research Institute, established in 1994 in Tehran, and the World Congress on Mulla Sadra in 1999 are the best examples.

After Mulla Sadra’s death, India was the first place outside Iran to show his influence. A remarkable number of expositions and commentaries have been written on one of his marginal works called Commentary on Sharh al-Hidayah in India where it has been taught as a course book of Islamic philosophy for several centuries. Later, the Shi'i seminaries of Iraq in the city of Najaf and some influential thinkers in Pakistan also welcomed Mulla Sadra's philosophy.

Mulla Sadra was introduced into the West at the end of the nineteenth century by the German orientalist, Max Horten (d. 1945) with an emphasis on the mystical aspect of the philosopher's work. Later during 1960's and 70's, the collaboration of the French scholar Henry Corbin (d. 1978) with Toshihiko Izutsu (d.1986 ) from Japan and Seyyed Hossein Nasr (b. 1933) from Iran, led to a full-fledged introduction of Mulla Sadra into Western academia as part of a wider project of reviving "perennial wisdom". Following their work, Mulla Sadra has been translated, taught, and discussed in academic journals and circles both in Europe and North America. The contemporary generation of Mulla Sadra scholars, though approaching Mulla Sadra from different points of view, are illuminating various aspects of the philosopher's work.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Philosophical Works

  • Mulla Sadra, Risala-yi si asl. Seyyed Hossein Nasr (ed.). (Tehran: Mulla Sadra Research Institute, 1381AH solar).  
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-muta'aliya fi asfar al-aqliya al-arba'a. 5. Muhammad Reza Muzaffar (ed.). 9 vols. (Beirut: Dar al-ihya ' al-turath al-Arabi, 1999).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Hikmat al-'Arshiyya. Ghulam Ahani (ed.). (Isfahan: Isfahan University press, 1340 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh al-Hidaya.Ahmad Shirazi (ed.). (Facsimile repr. Qom: Intishsrat-i Bidar. 1313 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mabda' wa'l-ma'ad. Ahmad Hosseini Ardakani (ed.). (Tehran: Sitad-i Inqilab-i Farhangi, Markaz-i Nashr-i Danishgahi, 1983).
  • Mulla Sadra, Tafsir al-Qur’an al-karim. M. Khajavi (ed.). 7 vols. (Qom: Intisharat-i Bidar, 1988).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Mazahir al-ilahiyya. 3. Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1387 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Shawahid al-rububiyya. Javad Mosleh (trans.). (Tehran: Soroush Press, 2006).
  • Mulla Sadra, Majmu'a-yi rasa'il-i falsafi-yi Sadr al-muta'allihin. Hamid Naji Isfahani (ed.). (Tehran: Hikmat, 1385AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, al-Masha'ir.Sayyid Jalal al-Din Ashtiyani (ed.). (Qom: Office of Islamic Propagation of the Seminary of Qom, 1386 AH solar).
  • Mulla Sadra, Mafatih al-ghayb. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). (Beirut: Mu 'assasat al-Tarikh al-Arabi, 2002 rpt).
  • Mulla Sadra, Sharh-i Usul al-Kafi. Muhammad Khawjavi (ed.). 4 vols. (Tehran: Pizhuhishgah-i Ulūm-i Insani va Mutala'at-i Farhangi, 2004).

b. English Translation of Primary Literature

  • Mahdi Dasht Bozorgi and Fazel Asadi Amjad, Divine Manifestations: Concerning the Secrets of the Sciences of Perfection (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • William Chittick, The Elixir of the Gnostics (Provo: Brigham Young University Press, 2003).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • T. Kirmani, The Manner of the Creation of Actions (Tehran: SIPRIn, 2004).
  • J. Lameer, Conception and Belief in Sadr al-Din Shirazi (Tehran: Iranian Academy of Philosophy, 2005).
  • Parviz Morewedge, The Metaphysics of Mulla Sadra: The Book of Metaphysical Prehensions (New York: Society for the Study of Islamic Philosophy and Science, 1992).
  • James Morris, The Wisdom of the Throne (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1981).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr and Ibrahim Kalin, Metaphysical Penetrations: A Parallel English-Arabic Text by Mulla Sadra (Provo: Brigham Young Press, 2013).
  • Latimah Peerwani, On the Hermeneutics of the Light Verse of the Qur 'an (London: ICAS Press, 2004).
  • Colin Turner, Challenging Islamic Fundamentalism: The Three Principles of Mulla Sadra (London: Routledge, 2011).

c. Secondary Books in European Languages

  • Alparslan Açikgenç, Being and Existence in Sadra and Heidegger: A Comparative Ontology (Kuala Lumpur: International Institute of Islamic Thought and Civilization, 1993).
  • Reza Akbarian, The Fundamentals of Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Reza Akbarian, Islamic Philosophy: Mulla Sadra and the Quest of “Being” (London: Xlibris, 2009).
  • Cécile Bonmariage, Le Réel et les réalités: Mulla Sadra Shirazi et la structure de la réalité (Paris: Vrin, 2008).
  • Maria Massi Dakake,"Hierarchies of Knowing in Mulla Sadra's Commentary on Usul al-Kafi." Journal of Islamic Philosophy 6 (2010).
  • Mahdi Dehbashi, Transubstantial Motion and the Natural World (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Max Horten, Das philosophische System von Schirázi (Strasbourg: Trübner, 1913).
  • Christian Jambet, The Act of Being: The Philosophy of Revelation in Mulla Sadra. Jeff Fort (trans.). (New York: Zone Books, 2006).
  • Christian Jambet, Mort et résurrection en islam: L’audelàselon Mulla Sadra (Paris: Albin Michel, 2008).
  • Christian Jambet, Se rendre immortel (Saint Clémentde Rivière: Fata Morgana, 2002).
  • Ibrahim Kalin, Knowledge in Later Islamic Philosophy. Mulla Sadra on Existence, Intellect, and Intuition (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal. From Essence to Being: The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra and Martin Heidegger (London: ICAS Press, 2010).
  • Muhammad Kamal, Mulla Sadra’s Transcendent Philosophy (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006).
  • Sayeh Meisami, Mulla Sadra (Oxford: Oneworld, 2013).
  • Mahmoud Khatami, From a Sadrean POint of View: Toward an Ontetic Elimination of the Subjectivistic Self (London: London Academy of Iranian Studies, 2004).
  • Megawati Moris, Mulla Sadra’s Doctrine of the Primacy of Existence ( KualaLumpur: ISTAC, 2003).
  • Zailan Moris, Revelation, Intellectual Intuition and Reason in the Philosophy of Mulla Sadra: An Analysis of the al-Hikmahal‘Arshiyyah (London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2002).
  • Seyyed Hossein Nasr, Sadr al-Din Shirazi and His Transcendent Theosophy. 2nd ed. (Tehran: Institute for Humanities and Cultural Studies, 1997).
  • Fazlur Rahman, The Philosophy of Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1975).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra Shirazi: His Life and Works and the Sources for Safavid Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
  • Sajjad Rizvi, Mulla Sadra and Metaphysics: Modulation of Being (London: Routledge, 2009).
  • Mohammed Rustom, "Psychology, Eschatology, Imagination, in Mulla Sadra Shirazi's Commentary on the Hadith of Awakening," Islam & Science, vol 5 (summer 2007) No 1.
  • Mohammed Rustom, The Triumph of Mercy: Philosophy and Scripture in Mulla Sadra (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2012).
  • Mahdi Ha'iri Yazdi, The Principles of Epistemology in Islamic Philosophy: Knowledge by Presence (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992).

 

Author Information

Sayeh Meisami
Email: meisamis@queensu.ca
Queen’s University School of Religion
Canada

Zhang Junmai (Carsun Chang, 1877-1969)

Zhang JunmaiZhang Junmai (Chang Chun-mai, 1877-1969), also known as Carsun Chang, was an important twentieth-century Chinese thinker and a representative of modern Chinese philosophy. Zhang’s participation in “The Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923, in which he defended his Neo-Confucian views against those of Chinese progressives and scientists, made a strong philosophical impression on an entire generation of Chinese intellectuals by championing the value of traditional Confucian truth claims and asserting the limits of scientific knowledge.  Subsequently, Zhang’s two-volume study of The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought (1957) and his Manifesto for the Reappraisal of Chinese Culture (1958) cemented his identification with Confucianism, and the view of Confucianism as compatible with modernity, in the English-speaking philosophical world. Despite his association with Confucianism, Zhang was deeply influenced by the work of the French thinker Henri Bergson and exponents of German Idealism, particularly Immanuel Kant and Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel. Zhang is best known today, however, not for his original philosophical work but rather for his political activities during China’s Republican era (1912-1949), through which he and his “Third Force” party attempted to mediate between the polarized Nationalist and Communist factions in the Chinese political landscape, as well as his promotion of Neo-Confucian studies in the West. His personal motto was, “Do not forget philosophy because of politics, and do not forget politics because of philosophy.” Due perhaps to his acknowledgment of Western influences as well as his involvement in politics, Zhang remains one of the modern Confucian movement’s most understudied figures, especially in comparison to his contemporaries Feng Youlan and Mou Zongsan. Yet his dual participation in both philosophy and politics makes him an exemplary Confucian and an embodiment of the Neo-Confucian ideal of “the unity of knowledge and action” (zhixing heyi).

Table of Contents

  1. Early Life
  2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity
  5. Influence and Key Interpreters
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Secondary Studies

1. Early Life

The man known as Zhang Junmai was born Zhang Jiasen, son of a merchant family in the Jiading district of China’s Jiangsu Province, on January 18, 1887. His early education included the memorization of the Four Books and Five Classics of traditional Confucianism.  At the age of eleven, however, his forward-thinking family sent him to study Western history and science as well as the English language, although he continued to read the work of influential Neo-Confucian thinkers such as Zhu Xi. At the age of fifteen, he passed the district-level civil service examination and earned the basic shengyuan or xiucai degree, which entitled its bearers to exemption from corvée labor and corporal punishments and granted them access to local government facilities.  After continuing his studies for a few more years, Zhang taught English in Hunan Province for two years before traveling to Tōkyō, Japan in 1906 and enrolling in Waseda University’s undergraduate program in economics and political science. Like many other Chinese intellectuals of that era, he intended to take advantage of Japan’s recent and rapid modernization by studying Western thought while remaining within an East Asian cultural context.

In Japan, Zhang befriended the constitutional monarchist Liang Qichao (1873-1929), a political reformer whose activities led to his exile in 1898.  Zhang began to publish articles in Liang’s biweekly, New Citizen (Xinmin Congbao), including translations of excerpts from John Stuart Mill’s Considerations on Representative Government. Zhang’s other activities within expatriate Chinese circles included participation in the creation of the Political Information Society (Zhengwen she), which competed with Sun Yat-sen’s United League (Tongmeng hui) for the hearts and minds of reform-minded Chinese of the period. After graduating from Waseda in 1911, he returned to China and successfully passed the entrance examination for the Hanlin Academy, a prestigious Confucian college founded in the eighth century. However, the Hanlin Academy, like other official Confucian institutions, soon fell victim to the Chinese Revolution, which swept away this and other vestiges of imperial rule in favor of a more democratic and scientifically-minded “New China.” Unable to pursue his dream of becoming a government official, Zhang returned to his ancestral home, where he was appointed chairman of the local parliament. Soon afterward, Zhang’s publication of an article critical of government policy toward Mongolia led to his proscription, and he fled to Germany to avoid repression.

In Germany, as in Japan, Zhang once more pursued academic studies, registering at the University of Berlin for preparatory coursework that would lead to enrollment in the University’s doctoral program in law and political science. World events disrupted his plans yet again when the First World War broke out in 1914. Zhang turned his attention to the ongoing conflict, publishing articles in about the European political and military situations in Chinese newspapers. In 1915, Zhang traveled to England before returning to China one year later to assume the editorship of the newspaper New Current Affairs (Shishi xinbao) and teach law at Beijing University. With the conclusion of hostilities in 1919, Zhang toured Europe in the company of Liang Qichao and other Chinese intellectuals and attempted to intervene in the transfer of sovereignty over China’s Shandong Province (the home region of Confucius) from Germany to Japan by the Peace Conference of Versailles that ended the war. Having recently produced a Chinese translation of the American president Woodrow Wilson’s “Fourteen Points,” which justified the Allies’ use of force in the name of democracy and national self-determination, Zhang was devastated and rapidly lost interest in politics, turning his attention “from social sciences to philosophy,” as he later called this crucial transition in his life.

In January 1921, Zhang met with Rudolf Eucken (1846–1926) in Jena, Germany. This encounter was perhaps one of the most important turning points in Zhang’s life. After a brief interview, Zhang decided to stay in Jena to learn philosophy under Eucken’s patronage. Studying with Eucken opened Zhang’s mind to new sets of ideas, especially those of Henri Bergson (1859-1941), and questions of life, ethics and culture gained a more important place in his thought. In 1922, Zhang collaborated with Eucken in the writing of a book in German entitled Das Lebensproblem in China und in Europa (The Problem of Human Life in China and Europe). The first half of the book, written by Eucken, was a short introduction to the history of European conceptions of life, while the second half, written by Zhang, dealt with the outlooks on life found in the work of major Chinese philosophers. Although Zhang’s treatment of Chinese thought was mainly historical in perspective, this text marks the first occasion on which he drew parallels between Confucian traditions and the philosophy of Kant. Here, Zhang argued that Confucius’ dictum that “what the superior man seeks is in himself, while what the petty man seeks is in others” (Analects 15:21) was comparable to Kant’s claim that the sources of morality are to be found within oneself. Thus, in Zhang’s view, both Confucianism and Kantianism see human morality as grounded in human nature and thus autonomous.

Despite Zhang’s immersion in philosophical studies, he remained active in politics. During his time in Germany, he met with many activists and leaders, including the social democrat Philip Scheidemann (1865–1939) and the architect of Germany’s post-war constitution, Hugo Preuss (1860–1925). These encounters with Weimar Republic intellectuals helped to form Zhang’s conceptions of socialism and exerted a lasting influence on his dual life in politics and philosophy. Both aspects of this dual life were expressed in his participation in “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists” of 1923.

2. The Debate of 1923 and Zhang’s Moral Metaphysics

Having returned to China, in February 1923 Zhang gave a speech at Beijing’s Qinghua School (later Qinghua University) about the differences between science and what he called “outlooks on life” (rensheng guan). In this speech, Zhang claimed that the former is characterized by “objectivity,” “logic,” “analytic methods,” “causality,” and “uniform phenomena,” while the latter are “subjective,” “intuitive,” and “synthetic,” based on “free will.” Moreover, he defended the idea that, in her path to modernization, China should not only consider the sciences but also ought to define a new way, based on the “outlooks on life” of ancient Chinese sages. Zhang’s position drew considerable criticism from intellectuals associated with the anti-traditional May Fourth Movement, especially the famous geologist Ding Wenjiang (1887–1936). The difference of opinion between Zhang and Ding developed into a major political and philosophical event in the intellectual history of Republican China and became known as “the Debate between Metaphysicians and Scientists.” This debate played an important role in the emergence of a neo-conservative trend in modern Chinese thought by raising the questions of what place science ought to have in modern Chinese society and whether scientism and positivism ought to influence modern Chinese worldviews.  The debate also played an important role in the development of Zhang’s philosophy insofar as it prompted the first publication of Zhang’s philosophical views in Chinese.

By 1923, Zhang’s conception of himself as a “realist idealist” (weishi de weixin zhuyi)—one who refused to sacrifice empirical issues for the sake of his deeply-held ideals—was fully established. Because of Zhang’s attraction to the thought of Bergson and Eucken, he was often criticized as an “anti-rationalist” (fan lixing zhuyi zhe). What his critics appear to have had in mind was not an opposition to reason on Zhang’s part, but rather his concern to avoid the over-use of the “process of abstraction” (chouxiang licheng). On Zhang’s view, when considering abstractions such as “Humanity” or “Nature,” one should always keep in mind that they are real and in front of us. Instead of building abstract systems and concepts, Zhang wanted to construct a philosophy that would embrace the reality and the fullness of the universe.

Zhang founded his “realist idealist” philosophy on the basis of a classically dualistic conception of the world. On the one hand, there is matter (wuzhi or wu); on the other hand, there is spirit (jingshen) or mind (xin). Zhang rejected monistic conceptions of the world as incoherent, going so far as to translate the English philosopher C. E. M. Joad’s Mind and Matter, which advocated the same position, in 1926. Zhang’s dichotomy between mind and matter is a structural division in his philosophy, which generates a series of opposing notions: matter is outside (wai) of the self and is fixed (ding), while mind or spirit is always inside (nei) the self and in motion (dong). The material world of nature is governed by causality, while the spiritual world of humanity is conducted by free will (ziyou yizhi). In later years, when discussing the relation between liberty (ziyou) and power (quanli) in political philosophy, Zhang categorized the former as belonging to the realm of spirit and the latter as relative to matter. His division between science and “outlooks on life” thus is an extension of these binary oppositions that are basic to his thought.

Zhang regarded science (kexue) as a plural signifier and subdivided it into two types: “material sciences” (wuzhi kexue) and “spiritual sciences” (jingshen kexue). This opposition was based on the German distinction between “natural sciences” (Naturwissenschaften or Exactewissenchaften) and “spiritual sciences” (Geistwissenchaften). While his opponents advocated science as one universal epistemology based on specific methodology, Zhang argued that one should consider sciences according to their objects, which could be any of three types: “inert” (si zhi wu), “alive” (huo zhi wu), or “alive and thinking” (youhuo yousi zhi wu). Incapable of moving by themselves, inert objects are bound to follow the rules of causality. Their movements can be explained by natural laws, and it is the purpose of material sciences to discover and analyze these laws. For instance, astronomy aims at explaining how planets gravitate around the sun. On Zhang’s account, physics and astronomy are the most archetypal material sciences.

Although plants and animals lack “mind” in Zhang’s sense, they are alive nonetheless, so for Zhang, their analysis raises further issues.  Unlike inert objects, plants and animals can move on their own, so despite the fact that causality applies to them, it doesn’t explain everything. But Zhang insisted that the presence of life in itself couldn’t be questioned by science. Following the ideas of the German vitalist Hans Driesch (1867–1941)—who was at that time visiting in China, where Zhang served as his translator—Zhang seems to believe that there is an entelechy, a driving principle that directs life and its development without being part of the soul or the organism, the existence of which precludes questioning its manifestation. To Zhang, the very foundations of life were completely impossible to analyze. Therefore, biology was not literally “the science of what is alive” but only the science that analyzes the material structure and development of living animals and plants

As for what Zhang called “spiritual sciences”—by which he meant something like social sciences—these moved beyond the realm of matter and were capable of analyzing humanity itself. Yet all the natural laws that could be found in those sciences were always linked to a material aspect of life. For instance, Zhang accepted that there were laws of development in economy; economy and society were at some point to follow specific patterns. But he insisted that these laws could only be found because there are material and fixed data to analyze. Economics, for example, deals with manufactured goods. On Zhang’s account, spiritual sciences could discover and analyze laws of nature only if their object was somehow linked to something material. Even if there are laws that condition the development of social phenomena, human beings still can use their minds and free will to modify the situation. For that reason, social laws or historical patterns can only be sought in the past.  Following Bergson, Zhang noted that the human spirit is in perpetual transformation (xin zhi wanbian): it is impossible to divide thought into fixed mental states, as our minds are always on the move (dong). Having no place to settle, no analysis can be made. Therefore, for Zhang, there cannot be any real psychology, but only physiology, a study of the relation between stimuli and the mind. According to Zhang, science cannot predict the future of humanity, which is why he rejected Marxism.

In contrast to such “sciences,” Zhang outlined his understanding of “outlooks on life” as a coherent alternative to claiming that everything could be understood and controlled by Science. In her fight for a new culture (xin wenhua), China was to cast away naturalism and positivism, and develop a new “outlook on life,” based on both Western modernity and the teachings of the ancient Chinese sages, that did not exclude or condemn metaphysics. Zhang even claimed that the introduction of Bergson’s and Eucken’s philosophies to China could give birth to “Neo-Song [Dynasty] Learning” (xin songxue 新宋學), just as the introduction of Buddhism to China had permitted the emergence of the original Neo-Confucianism of the Song dynasty (songxue).

In Eucken’s philosophy, humanity is a being at the frontier of matter and spirit, and is in a perpetual struggle to achieve a spiritual life that can overcome his material nature. By promoting metaphysics, Zhang wished to foster human spiritual life and dismiss a scientistic conception of the world that would bind human beings in the web of material causality.   Borrowing from Eucken’s Die Lebenschauungen der grossen denker (Outlooks on Life of the Great Thinkers, 1890), Zhang defined “outlook on life” as follows:

The observations, holds, hopes, and demands that I have toward the persons and the objects external to myself—that’s what I call an outlook on life. (Zhang 1981, p. 935)

Outlooks on life are not under the control of sciences. They find their source in the self (wo). Considering that “toward the world, man’s life is inner as spirit and outer as matter” (ibid.), outlooks on life are in fact what link our spiritual life with the material world. Even if people of the past can be models to follow (Zhang 1981, p. 913), everyone ought to develop his own outlook on life according to what his heart-mind (xin) tells him. That is what Zhang called the mandate of moral conscience (liangxin zhi ming). For Zhang as for other Confucians, the heart-mind is the center of the self; every moral thought and volition is generated from it. Having three principal functions, knowledge (zhi 智), emotions (qing 情) and will (zhi 志), it is what makes us human. In total opposition to the view defended by Hu Shi (1891-1962) at that time, Zhang argued that the difference between humans and animals is qualitative, not quantitative. The use of such concepts and terminology shows how deep the influence of Mencius’ and Wang Yangming’s moral thought on Zhang was. As a thinker who was steeped in Confucian tradition, Zhang considered human beings to be good by nature and wanted to promote Neo-Confucian metaphysics as a means to cultivate oneself (xiushen).

Finally, a word should be said about Zhang’s debt to Kant, which was the result of his lifelong infatuation with this eighteenth-century German thinker. Zhang’s epistemology was mainly drawn from Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason (1781); he considered Kant to be the man who “had succeeded in harmonizing British empiricism and German rationalism” (Zhang 1981, p. 949). For Zhang, knowledge is the result of an encounter between material sense information and the innate categories of the mind. Human beings have innate categories or “concepts of reason” (lixing zhi gainian) that enable them to understand, classify, and aggregate all of their sensations (ganjue). It is these concepts of reason that link sensations to meanings (yiyi). Later, Zhang suggested that knowledge, built up from the encounter of sensations and concepts of reason, is always internal to one’s mind. For instance, in 1957, he wrote that the Song dynasty Confucian thinker Ch’eng I’s statement ”Human nature is reason” [(xing ji li ye], “means nothing other than the rationalist doctrine that forms of thought exist a priori in the mind” (Chang 1957, p. 35). For Zhang, the key philosophical question was that of the relationship between a mind able of knowing (zhizhi zhi xin) and the myriad things (wanwu zhi you) or phenomenal universe, through which knowledge of all that exists, materially and spiritually, could be integrated. Assuming that the principle of mind (xin li) is universal, Zhang anticipated that the development of thought ought to be somehow similar in every culture. This argument would form the basis of his claim that a genuine Chinese modernity was possible.

3. Political Philosophy

Despite Zhang’s leap “from social sciences to philosophy,” he did not abandon political life.    On the contrary, he participated in the drafting of a new Chinese constitution and wrote

On the Meaning of Constitutions (1921).  He struggled to introduce socialism in China. Very much taken with the newly-established Weimar Republic in Germany, Zhang wished to establish a very similar political system in China. In 1923, he opened a “Political Institute” in the suburbs of Shanghai, the aim of which was to form a new political elite that would be able to shape the nation’s affairs in future years. Under its auspices, Chinese students were exposed to political philosophy, economics, sociology, and international relations as well as Zhang’s critiques of both the Chinese Communist Party and the Guomindang (Kuomintang, KMT) or Chinese Nationalist Party, which contended against each other for political and later military supremacy throughout the 1920s, ’30s, and ’40s. After the KMT occupation of Shanghai in 1927, Zhang was forced to close the Institute and ventured into underground political activities. With Li Huang (1895—1991), a leader of the Chinese Youth Party (Zhongguo qingnian dang), he illegally published a journal, The New Way (Xinlu), in which he proclaimed his political values:

 [D]emocratic government, opposition to both one-class and one-party dictatorships, freedom of speech and association, opposition to the denial of these basic human rights under the pretext of party or military rule, the opposition to party control of education, of judicial affairs, of civil servants, and the use of the army for personal or party purposes. (Chi, p. 141)

These points can be regarded as the key ideas of Zhang’s political thought at the time. In opposition to nationalist and communist conceptions of the political power in China, Zhang totally forbade the political parties to indoctrinate their members, to use military force or to practice dictatorial politics—all of which may have prevented Zhang’s own political parties from ever succeeding in the brutal political climate of China during the 1930s. Frustrated by chronic repression at the hands of the KMT, Zhang fled China once again and returned to Germany, where he obtained a position as Professor of Chinese Philosophy at the University of Jena through the assistance of Eucken’s former students. Eventually, he returned to China just before Japanese invasion of Manchuria in September 1931. In this politically-charged and highly unstable climate, Zhang assumed professorial duties in philosophy at Yanjing University in Beijing, teaching mostly about Hegel, before being ejected from his position as a result of his critical stance vis-a-vis the KMT government. Siding with the warlord Chen Jitang, the de facto ruler of Guangdong Province, Zhang again found work as a professor of philosophy, this time teaching Neo-Confucianism—first at Sun Yat-sen University and later at his own Learning Ocean Academy (Xuehai Shuyuan).

At this institution, which blended traditional Confucian education with what Zhang saw as the best of Western learning (humanities, social sciences, and physical education), he was able to put into practice what he had defended during the debate of 1923: an education that would place equal and shared emphasis on the humanities (especially metaphysics), the arts, sports, and of course the sciences. In 1939, Zhang opened another such school: the Institute of National Culture (Minzu Wenhua Xueyuan), the guiding documents of which stated:

The objectives of this academy are as follows: one, to achieve one’s personality; two, to temper and foster intelligence in order to contribute to the world scholarship; three, to deploy these activities, in which moral and knowledge are one, to participate grandly in the ordering of the world (or statecraft). (Zhang 1981, p. 1435)

To participate in the world, either as politicians or as scholars, students were first to develop their personality. For Zhang, such psychological development, along with physical ability and intellectual knowledge, were all necessary to become a full human being. Self-cultivation through education, in turn, was key to the development of Chinese democracy, which was Zhang’s primary political commitment. In his political philosophy, there is a very strong bond between the people and the idea of the State. Democracy should not be implemented from above, but rather it should arise from the heart-minds of citizens. Influenced by Confucian ethics, Zhang appears to have viewed democracy through the prism of the canonical Confucian text known as the Daxue (Great Learning), which states:

To bring the world at peace, one should first govern one’s State; to govern one’s State, one should first order one’s family; to order one’s family, one should first cultivate oneself.

Zhang believed that the Chinese people would permit the emergence of democracy as the result of their own self-cultivation. For him, the State was no longer understood as a simple technical term of political science. It was the realization of the spirit of a people, founded on the basis of law and morality. Borrowing the Hegelian idea that “State is the realization of the Spirit [or Reason]” (guojia zhe jingshen zhi shixian ye), Zhang linked the question of the State with a certain humanism and a valorization of Chinese culture. The emergence of a new political system was to be the result of a New Culture (xin wenhua), from which would emerge a new outlook on life. Unfortunately, Zhang’s academies never stayed open very long. The Ocean Learning Academy was active for only two years, while the Institute of National Culture was closed in 1942, after three years of operation.

4. Confucianism and Chinese Modernity

As was the case with Zhang’s moral metaphysics and political philosophy, so also in his understanding of culture did Zhang cleave closely to his Confucian heritage. His philosophy of culture upheld a certain conservatism, according to which both Chinese cultural unity and Chinese social development could proceed organically from a shared basis in Neo-Confucian thought. In The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936), which can be regarded as a response to Liang Shuming’s Eastern and Western Cultures and Their Philosophies (1921), Zhang defended this view:

Spiritual freedom [jingshen ziyou] is the foundation of a national culture [minzu wenhua] and therefore it should be the central principle to direct the politics, the sciences and the arts of China from now on. (Zhang 2006b, p. 1)

Zhang argued that a culture is a spiritual entity that is created by, and evolved through, the free contributions of its people—not a static expression of an ahistorical will, as Liang claimed. The nation is in fact the group of persons that build a cultural unity and live together within it. The influence of the Western philosophers of history Oswald Spengler (1880-1936) and Arnold Toynbee (1889-1975) can be seen in Zhang’s view. Zhang understood European modernity to be the result of a threefold historical process, which consisted of (1) religious reform (zongjiao gaige), (2) scientific development (kexue fazhan), and (3) the emergence of democratic government (minzhu zhengzhi). The challenge for China, therefore, lay not with importing European modernity, but rather with completing its own historical process of development in evolutionary terms specific to Chinese culture.

Like many Chinese intellectuals of the early twentieth century, Zhang advocated the need for a “New Culture”; like his rival Liang, Zhang believed that Chinese culture would become the global culture of the future. However, Zhang believed that this “New Culture” would develop only in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the West, just as Neo-Confucianism had developed in response to the intellectual challenge represented by the introduction of Buddhism from India—an historical event to which Zhang repeatedly referred as a positive precedent for China’s ability to adapt to foreign systems of thought. As “the culture of harmony,” Chinese culture would find the middle way (zhezhong) between all global philosophical and cultural trends—but only if she initiated the first step in the threefold historical process by rediscovering and reviving the “Chinese national spirit” (Zhonghua minzu jingshen), which Zhang identified with Neo-Confucianism. After China revived the quintessence of her past culture—that is, Neo-Confucianism as interpreted by Zhang—she would be able to formulate a new outlook on life, which in turn would give birth to a new culture. From this new culture, a new political system and a new economic organization soon would follow.

However, unlike many Chinese intellectuals of the era who defended a racial conception of the nation, Zhang had no interest in the question of blood lineage. As he pointed out in The Chinese Culture of Tomorrow (1936) and The Way to Establish the State (1938), one could not find any racial unity in China; since various “barbarian” invasions had produced a “blood mix” in the population, the blood of the Han ethnic majority was no longer “pure.”  Constructing a blood-based nationalism would be irrelevant and self-destructive, but constructing a culture-based nationalism was another matter:

I won’t dare say that in History there was such a thing as a pure blood Han nation, however I can attest that there is a Han Culture, which embodies the language spoken, the characters used, the calendar, the customs, the rites and so on. (Zhang 2006d, p. 9)

Zhang’s activity as a non-aligned political thinker was curtailed by the end of cooperation between the KMT and the Chinese Communist Party in 1941, and he was placed under house arrest because of his opposition to KMT policies. In 1944, he was released and traveled to the United States, where he attended the founding meeting of the United Stations. While in the United States, Zhang renewed his interest in constitutionalism and spent much of his time studying the American Constitution. After returning to China in 1946, he began to argue that a conception of human rights, or at least its seeds, could be found in the Chinese intellectual tradition, especially in the thought of Mencius. His work became the basis of the Constitution of the Republic of China adopted in 1946, which is still in effect in Taiwan today. The implementation of the Constitution failed to resolve China’s ongoing civil war, however, and with the triumph of Communist forces in 1949, Zhang fled to a life of exile in Hong Kong.

In Hong Kong, Zhang produced The Third Force in China and initiated the modern Chinese discourse on democracy’s roots in Chinese tradition. Having identified elements of democratic sensibilities in ancient Chinese texts, Zhang held out hope that the establishment of