Category Archives: 17th Century European

Margaret Cavendish (1623—1673)

Margaret Lucas Cavendish, the Duchess of Newcastle, was a philosopher, poet, playwright and essayist. Her philosophical writings were concerned mostly with issues of metaphysics and natural philosophy, but also extended to social and political concerns. Like Hobbes and Descartes, she rejected what she took to be the occult explanations of the Scholastics. Against Descartes, however, she rejected dualism and incorporeal substance of any kind. Against Hobbes, on the other hand, she argued for a vitalist materialism, according to which all things in nature were composed of self-moving, animate matter. Specifically, she argued that the variety and orderliness of natural phenomena cannot be explained by blind mechanism and atomism, but instead require the parts of nature to move themselves in regular ways, according to their distinctive motions. And in order to explain that, she argued for panpsychism, the view that all things in nature possess minds or mental properties. Indeed, she even argued that all bodies, including tables and chairs, as well as parts of the bodies of organisms, such as the human heart or liver, know their own distinctive motions and are thereby able to carry it out. These different parts of nature, each knowing and executing their distinctive motions, create and explain the harmonious and varied order of it. In several ways, Cavendish can be seen as one of the first philosophers to take up several interesting positions against the mechanism of the modern scientific worldview of her time. Thus it is possible to add that she presages thinkers such as Spinoza and Leibniz.

When she turned to discuss political and social issues, Cavendish’s metaphysical commitments seem to remain. Cavendish was a staunch royalist and aristocrat; perhaps not surprisingly, then, she argued that each person in society has a particular place and distinctive activity and that, furthermore, social harmony only arises when people know their proper places and perform their defining actions. She was therefore critical of social mobility and unfettered political liberty, seeing them as a threat to the order and harmony of the state. Even so, her writings also contain nuanced and complex discussions of gender and religion, among a variety of other topics.

Despite her conservative political tendencies, Cavendish herself can be seen as a model for later women writers. She wrote dozens of books, at least five of which alone were on natural philosophy, under her own name, a feat which may make her the most published female author of the seventeenth century and one of the most prolific women philosophers in the early modern period. In addition to writing much on natural philosophy, she wrote on a dizzying array of other topics and, perhaps most impressively, in a wide range of genres. Her philosophically informed poetry, plays, letters and essays are at times as philosophically valuable as her treatises of natural philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Natural Philosophy
    1. Materialism
    2. Vitalism and the Variability Argument
    3. Panpsychism
    4. God
  3. Political Philosophy
    1. Religious Liberty
    2. Royalism and Aristocracy
    3. Gender
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Cavendish’s Works in the 17th Century
    2. Modern Editions of Her Works
    3. Secondary Literature

1. Life and Works

Margaret Lucas was born in 1623 in Colchester into a family of aristocrats and staunch royalists. She received little formal education, being tutored at home with her seven siblings, of which she was the youngest. She reports having spent much time in conversation with one of her brothers, John, who considered himself a scholar and who would become a founding member of the Royal Society. She joined the Queen’s court and served as a maid to Queen Henrietta Maria, following her into exile in 1644, during the English Civil War. While in exile she met William Cavendish, then Marquess and later Duke of Newcastle. They were married in 1645.

While in exile in Paris and Antwerp, she reports discussing philosophy and natural science with her husband and his younger brother, Sir Charles Cavendish, who held a regular salon attended by Thomas Hobbes, Kenelm Digby and occasionally René Descartes, Marin Mersenne and Pierre Gassendi. Margaret herself reports having attended several dinners, at which these philosophers were present, though she denies having spoken to them about any, but the most superficial of matters.

While her husband remained in exile, she returned in 1651 and again in 1653 to England. This was during the reign of Commonwealth, during which her husband, were he to have returned, would have had to renounce his royalism and swear fealty to the Commonwealth, as was required by the republican parliament of the time. The parliament did not extend that requirement to women, claiming that women were not capable of such political acts. Thus Margaret was allowed to return to England without swearing fealty to the Commonwealth.

During her 1653 visit, she arranged for the publication of her first collection of writings, Poems and Fancies and Philosophical Fancies. She reports having delivered the second philosophical treatise a few days too late to have it included with the first in a single publication, which had been her original intention. The publisher was Martin and Allestyre, at the Bell in St. Paul’s Churchyard, which was a well-regarded publisher, who later became the official publisher for the Royal Society. It is truly remarkable that she was able to secure their publication, as few women published philosophy in England in the seventeenth century, much less under their own name and while in exile.

The same publishing house would publish The World’s Olio and Philosophical and Physical Opinions in 1655 and Nature’s Pictures in 1656. The second work of 1655, Philosophical and Physical Opinions, contained five parts and 210 chapters, the first part of which, consisting of 58 chapters, was in fact a reprinting of her earlier Philosophical Fancies. With her 1655 Philosophical and Physical Opinions, she added a number of epistles and her “Condemning Treatise on Atoms” to the front matter and also extended the work beyond the earlier Philosophical Fancies significantly.

With the Restoration of Charles II to the throne, she returned to England with her husband and continued to write. In addition to publishing on natural philosophy, she also wrote essays on a remarkable variety of other topics, including the nature of poetry, the proper way to hold a feast, fame, women’s roles in society and many others. She also wrote many plays and poems, as well as a fantastic utopia, The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World in 1668.

There may have been some controversy over a woman publishing works on natural philosophy, as she felt the need to include several epistles, both from herself and from her husband and brother-in-law, attesting to the fact that she had written these works herself. Indeed, she returns to defend herself as an author and natural philosopher at a number of different places in her work, often in epistles to the reader. She also defends the propriety of her being so bold as to write in her own name and to think her thoughts worthy of publication. Her several discussions of fame are worth noting in this context.

She continued to write on natural philosophy, among other topics, to growing attention. She sent her works to many of the well-known philosophers then operating in England, as well as to the faculties at Cambridge and Oxford.  Indeed, after she had published her most famous work of natural philosophy, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy in 1666, she was invited to attend a meeting of the Royal Society, a privilege rarely granted to women at the time.

In all, she may be the most prolific woman writer of early modern Europe and certainly the most prolific woman philosopher. Depending on how one counts, she published over a dozen and perhaps as many as twenty works, at least five of which are works on natural philosophy and many more contain essays with substantive philosophical content.

2. Natural Philosophy

Cavendish wrote half a dozen of works on natural philosophy. Indeed, natural philosophy constituted the largest part of her philosophical output and a large part of her writing as a whole. Her philosophical commitments can be described as materialist, vitalist and panpsychist. In what follows, her philosophical discussions will be grouped around several recurring themes and arguments.

a. Materialism

Like Hobbes, Descartes or Bacon, Cavendish regularly motivates her position by attacking the Aristotelianism of the schools, mocking those whom her husband calls the “gown-tribe.” She criticized what she took to be their commitment to occult powers and incorporeal beings in nature and offers her materialism as an alternative. She explains that her intent is to provide a philosophical system accessible to all, without special training. From her earliest work, Philosophical Fancies, published in 1653, Cavendish argued for materialism in nature. In the first two chapters of that work, which she reprinted in Philosophical and Physical Opinions in 1655, she claims that nature is one infinite material thing, which she sometimes describes as “the substance of infinite matter” (“Condemning Treatise of Atomes”). This infinite material substance is composed of an infinite number of material parts, with infinite degrees of motion. Similarly, this motion is all of the same kind, differing from instance to instance only in swiftness or direction. In other words, the natural world is entirely constituted by a single type of stuff, which she calls matter and a single force, which she calls motion. She distinguishes the objects and events in nature from one another by the varying parts of matter, bearing different motions, within that one infinite material substance. She explicitly extends this materialist doctrine to the human mind in chapter 2 of the Philosophical Fancies, where she says that the forms of the gown-tribe, as well as human minds, are nothing but “matter moving, or matter moved.” Furthermore, she remained committed to this materialism throughout her career, such as in her Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy first published in 1666, claiming that all actions of sense or of reason are corporeal. Thus we see from the very beginning of her first work that she is a materialist.

The exact nature of her materialism develops over time, however. In her earliest work from 1653, she allows for an atomist account of nature and matter, though by 1656 she is already arguing against atomism in her “Condemning Treatise of Atomes”. Later, in her Observations from 1666, she provides at least two arguments against atomism. First, she argues that the concept of an extended yet indivisible body is incoherent, saying, “whatsoever has body, or is material, has quantity; and what has quantity, is divisible” (Ch. 31, 125); this is an argument that was commonly employed against atomism in the seventeenth century. She also argues that composite bodies, each with their own motions, could not account for the unity of the complex body, but would instead be like a swarm of bees or a school of fish. Atomism, she argues, cannot explain organic unity. She says, “[w]herefore, if there should be a composition of atoms, it would not be a body made of parts, but of so many whole and entire single bodies, meeting together as a swarm of bees...and the concourse of them would rather cause a confusion, than a conformity in nature” (Ch. 31, 129). Instead of atomism, Cavendish proposes that matter is both infinite in extension and always further divisible. Furthermore, for Cavendish, complex beings such as animals are composed of distinctive matter in motion, which she takes to provide them with their unity. Even so, her primary targets are not atomist materialism, as much as both the occultism of the Schools and the mechanism of some of her contemporaries.

She also applies her materialism to the human mind. In her early works, she suggests that there is nothing of the human being that is not material. For example, in her first work, she wrote a brief dialogue between body and mind, in which she claims that the only way the mind can attain any sort of life after the death of the body is by fame, that is, by being thought well of by others. Indeed, she elsewhere claims that "all the actions of sense and reason...are corporeal” and “sense and reason are the same in all creatures and all parts of nature” (Ch. 31, 128), as well as, “knowledge, being material, consists of parts” (Ch. 37, 160).

Cavendish seems to qualify her materialism with regard to the human soul later in her career, when she clarifies that her previously strong and consistent commitment to materialism only applies to the natural world. For example, in Observations, she claims that humans have both a material mind and, in addition, a supernatural, immaterial soul. She argues that the way, in which this supernatural soul is related to the material mind and body is itself supernatural. After all, she suggests, place is a property belonging only to bodies and thus, could not belong to an immaterial soul. Therefore, the way, in which the immaterial soul is related to the material person is itself a supernatural, that is, miraculous phenomenon. Unfortunately, she offers little explanation for this immaterial soul and refrains from explaining whether or how the immortal soul might interact at all with anything in nature, instead implying that it does not. To make matters even more confusing, she seems to amend her view in 1668 when claiming that only God is immaterial and all other things are material. It may be that she had changed her mind as to whether or not human beings have immaterial, supernatural souls, but the texts themselves do not seem to speak definitively.

Throughout her work, however, Cavendish did claim that human beings possess a material soul. She explains the material, natural soul in the same way, in which she explains the mind, through her distinction among the different degrees of motion in matter, as mentioned above. Briefly, she claims that matter may have differing degrees of motion, such that some matter is relatively inert and gross, that is, being composed of larger pieces of matter, which she sometimes calls “dull matter”. In contrast, there is also a finer and more rare matter, which possesses more motion. This faster and lighter matter infuses dull matter. The natural, material, human soul or mind, she explains, is the finer, rarer matter within our grosser, cruder material bodies. Scholars have noted the similarity this view bears to Stoic doctrine, in that the rarer, more quickly moving matter resembles the Stoic pneuma.

Just like the Stoics, she also explicitly states in her later works—and suggests at times in her earlier works—that all bodies are completely infused with varying degrees of this active matter. Indeed, it is this matter that accounts for the regularity of natural phenomena across all of nature. She says that “there can be no order, method or harmony, especially such as appears in the actions of nature, without there be reason to cause that order and harmony” (Ch 6, 207). She claims, for example, that animals possess motions visible externally, such as jumping or running, whereas vegetables and minerals possess and exhibit motions only detectable internally, such as contracting or dilating. She refers to the motions found in animals, vegetables and minerals to varying degrees as sensitive spirits, a term that calls to mind Descartes’ animal spirits. But even minerals and vegetables and also animals and humans possess a further, yet finer and more quickly moving form of matter, which she calls “rational spirits.” These rational spirits are the quickly moving, but rare pneuma-like matter described above, which ultimately explain the various motions and behaviors of the natural objects. Ultimately, though, these motions and the matter they infuse are of the same fundamental kind, differing only in their degree of motion. This view, coupled with her radical claims that “all motion is life” and “knowledge is motion” will lead to her vitalism and panpsychism.

Another of Cavendish’s distinctive commitments about the nature of matter is this: matter bears an infinite degree of motion and, crucially, it bears that motion eternally. In other words, if a bit of matter has a certain degree of motion, according to Cavendish, it cannot lose that degree of motion nor communicate it to another piece of matter. We might say that, for Cavendish, the particular degree of motion that a part of matter bears is essential to that part. Thus, the cruder and grosser matter that bears a lesser degree of matter does so by its nature and cannot lose or gain a degree of motion. Similarly, the more quickly moving, finer parts of matter also bear their greater degree of motion by nature and cannot gain, lose or communicate the motion either. This view is related to another major theme of Cavendish’s work, one that we might call vitalism.

b. Vitalism and the Variability Argument

In addition to her commitment to materialism, Cavendish took pains to reject a position that was often associated with materialism in the seventeenth century, namely that of mechanism. Mechanism can be understood as the view that the natural world, as well as human beings, are made up of uniform material components that interact according to laws of motion and collision. One statement of this view, with which Cavendish was familiar, can be found in the opening chapters of Thomas Hobbes’ Leviathan. René Descartes, too, provided a mechanistic account of the natural world—apart from his commitment to the existence of the immaterial souls of human beings, of course.

Cavendish argued that mechanism could not be an accurate account of the natural world, because it could not properly explain the world that we observe. She claimed that two notable features of the natural world are variety and orderliness. The world around us is full of a vast array of different sorts of creatures and things, each performing distinctive activities or bearing distinct properties. Despite the natural world’s plentitude, it was also orderly. If we understand the nature of a particular creature or substance, we could predict successfully how it might behave or react to certain stimuli. Cavendish reasoned that if the world was ultimately constituted by uniform matter, passively receiving and transferring motion, according to mathematical laws of collision, then the universe should be either entirely homogenous or entirely chaotic. In other words, if passive, uniform matter communicating motion was really all we had to explain nature, we would not be able to account for its variety and orderliness—it would lack one or the other.

Instead, she claimed, different parts of the infinite material substance bear different degrees of motion by nature. They cannot directly transfer motion from one body to another, since motion is a property of the body that possesses it and not as something that can exist apart from its body. Thus individual bodies cannot give or receive their motions. Hence, the phenomena we observe are not to be explained by reference to uniform pieces of matter exchanging motion via collision. Rather, she explains, what we see is like a dance, in which each body moves according to its own, distinctive, internal principle, such that a pattern might be created by the dancers on the dance floor. She explicitly offers this dance metaphor in her first work of 1653 and again in 1655. For example, when she explains perception, she claims that the rational spirits flow in and out of the body through the eyes and touch upon the object being perceived, intermixing with the rational spirits found therein. The object, possessing its own distinctive spirits and motions, dances a pattern before the rational spirits, which flow back into the eyes.  These rational spirits then take up the dance themselves, flowing back into the brain and continuing the dance, which she takes to be sufficient for the mind’s perceiving the object in virtue of the mind’s containing the distinctive dance or pattern. In these early works, she further explains that the rational spirits copy these dances based on a “natural sympathy” among adjacent bodies, particularly between the rational spirits of the perceiver and object perceived. Note that, throughout this account of perception, motion is never transferred from one body to another. Instead, motions and “dances” are taken up from the internal activity of the rational spirits, that is, from the nature of the moving matter. The matter moves itself according to its own nature and initiates changes in its own motion via natural sympathy.

By the 1660s, though, she largely replaces the dance metaphor with the terms “imitation” and “figuring out”, the latter in the sense of tracing or copying a shape or distinctive pattern of motion. Even so, the account is largely the same. Her argument from the Observations could be reconstructed as follows:

  1. Bodies move in orderly and infinitely variable ways.
  2. Either they are moved by spirits or they are moved by bodies.
  3. But not spirits because that is mysterious, so bodies.
  4. If bodily motion issues from the body, then, it must issue from either inanimate matter (mechanism) or animate matter (vitalism).
  5. But not inanimate matter (mechanism), for the mechanistic account of bodily motion, (such as animals spirits and inanimate fine particles that transmit force), cannot account for the infinite variety and orderliness of the activity in nature.
  6. So the bodily cause of motion must be the body’s animate matter, which (it is alleged) has an ability to produce an infinite variety of orderly effects.

This is what might be called the argument from the variability and regularity of nature for self-moving matter. Premise 5 implies the argument that if the world was ultimately constituted by uniform matter, passively receiving and transferring motion, according to mathematical laws of collision, then the universe should be either entirely homogenous or entirely chaotic. In this argument for self-moving matter, many of the central themes of Cavendish’s natural philosophy are visible: her materialist rejection of incorporeal causes, her denial of mechanistic explanation and her resulting vitalism.

Another significant feature of her natural philosophy, and one that appears especially clearly when she critiques mechanism, is her refusal to take mathematical physics as an exemplar. Whereas Cartesian and Hobbesian natural philosophy could be described as attempts to understand nature with metaphors and modes of explanation taken from the new, mathematical physics, Cavendish instead draws from other sources, especially her personal experiences with country life and, less directly, the life sciences. When explaining natural phenomena, she often makes reference to the behaviors of animals and humans, as well as her awareness of botanical phenomena. She in fact reported in the 1650s that Gerald’s Herbal, a botanical reference book, was the only scientific work she had read. Perhaps because of this, she often explained the behaviors of an animal’s or plant’s rational spirits in terms of their macro-level behaviors, rather than in terms of atomic or corpuscular, mathematical explanation. By the 1660s, at least, we know that she had read and engaged the work of other vitalist and anti-mechanists, such as the alchemist Johannes Baptista Van Helmont. However, even before that time, her preference for biological metaphors over those of mathematical physics was evident.

Cavendish’s preference for biological modes of explanation can also be seen in her organicism. Not only does she deny atomism, but she also argues that the parts of bodies in part possess their distinctive motions and natures in virtue of the larger, organic systems, in which they are located. She says, “[f]or example: an eye, although it be composed of parts, and has a whole and perfect figure, yet it is but part of the head, and could not subsist without it” (Observations, Ch. 31). This is not an argument for organicism; instead, she means it as an analogy to illustrate her views on individuals more generally.

Despite the similarities of her vitalism to that of Van Helmont or perhaps Henry More, Cavendish also departs from them in her commitment to materialism. Indeed, she accounts for life in nature by claiming that “[a]ll motion is life,” even in her first work of 1653. Human beings are alive, she says, because they are material beings composed of matter with varying degrees of motion moving in a distinctive pattern. For Cavendish that is all that is needed for something to be alive. Note, though, that all things in nature, from humans and animals and plants down to minerals and artifacts, are the things they are, because they are composed of matter with distinctive patterns and degrees of motion. In this regard, she resembles Hobbes, even though she will ultimately reject his mechanistic view of matter, especially with her view that all matter is self-moving. We might therefore say that Cavendish’s natural philosophy is committed to pan-vitalism or animism, or even, as Cudworth would later say, hylozoism. But we must remember that her view departs from the Cambridge Platonists and Van Helmont in denying that the principles of life are to be explained by reference to incorporeal powers, entities or properties. All matter is to some extent alive and all of nature is infused with a principle of life, but this principle of life is simply motion.

Thus Cavendish provides a fairly deflationary account of life as motion and in this regard her natural philosophy may resemble Hobbes or Descartes. Despite this similarity, Cavendish again rejects their mechanism in her denial of determinism, even with regards to bodily interaction. Though she often appeals to the orderliness and regularity of nature in defending her theory of self-moving matter, she also recognizes the presence of disorder in nature, such as in disease. In fact, she explains illness or disease as the rebellion of a part of the body against the whole, explaining that some bits of matter have freely chosen alternative motions and thus disrupted the harmonious all. In short, Cavendish ascribes a libertarian freedom not only to human agents but even to the parts of matter themselves, explaining the behaviors of organisms with a social ‘body politic’ metaphor. We might say, then, that she draws from experiences of the biological and botanical world to explain her metaphysics, but she also incorporates a Hobbesian sense of the body politic into her metaphysics and in so doing reinforces her rejection of the mechanistic worldview.

However, Cavendish does not stop at explaining the principle of life by reference to degrees of motion in matter, because she also claims to explain mental representation and ultimately knowledge in this way. When a particular pattern of motion occurs in the brain, say, via perception, the person perceives the object; for the person to have an idea of the object is just for her brain to contain its distinctive motion. More generally, she takes the presence of such patterned motions in matter to mean that said matter has knowledge, at least in some sense. Yet she also argues that such motions can be found throughout all of nature, every body possessing its own distinctive motions. For these reasons, her vitalist materialism fits nicely with her panpsychism.

c. Panpsychism

In saying that all motion is life and that all things in nature are composed of matter with a degree of motion, Cavendish affirms that life permeates all of the natural world, including what we might call inanimate objects. For Cavendish, inanimate objects are alive, because they possess motion, though they might have a lesser degree of motion, and thus a lesser degree of life, than an animal or human being. Indeed, she also believes that knowledge is similarly diffused across all of nature to greater and lesser degrees. For these reasons, we might call Cavendish an incremental naturalist with regard to knowledge and life. That is, she takes distinctively human traits such as knowledge and life to be natural properties that are present to varying degrees throughout all of nature.

Throughout her work, Cavendish argues that whatever has motion has knowledge and that knowledge is innate or internally directed motion. In her Philosophical Fancies of 1653, she explains that

the touch of the heel, or any part of the body else, is the like motion, as the thought thereof in the head; the one is the motion of the sensitive spirits, the other in the rational spirits, as touch from the sensitive spirits, for thought is only a strong touch, and touch a weak thought. So sense is a weak knowledge, and knowledge a strong sense, made by the degrees of the spirits (Chapter 45).

In the next chapter she continues to argue that all matter exhibits regular motion, which occurs because all matter is infused with sensitive spirits; but to have sensitive spirits is to be able to sense; thus all matter senses things.

Now, in her earliest work, she offers at best a “who knows so why not” sort of argument that matter thinks, saying, “[i]f so, who knows, but vegetables and minerals may have some of those rational spirits, which is a mind or soul in them, as well as man?" and “if their [vegetables and minerals] knowledge be not the same knowledge, but different from the knowledge of animals, by reason of their different figures, made by other kind of motion on other tempered matter, yet it is knowledge” (Chapter 46).

Later, for example in her Observations, she argues that the regularity of nature can best—or perhaps only—be explained by admitting that all material bodies possess knowledge. She argues that matter and material beings exhibit regular motion and then argues that “there can be no regular motion without knowledge, sense, and reason” (Observations, 129). Furhtermore, she argues that each part of the body and each object in nature exhibits a distinctive activity. The brain thinks; the stomach digests; the loins produce offspring—and they do so in regular and consistent ways. Indeed, each of these organs or parts of the body are themselves also composite, made up of an infinite number of smaller bodies. What unites them, however, is their distinctive motions, producing their distinctive behaviors. And Cavendish takes each of these distinctive motions to be a kind of knowledge.

She argues that we ought to think of these distinctive motions as knowledge, because that is the best, or perhaps only, way to explain the regularity and stability of these composites. If these parts are to do these things, they must know what they do, especially given the regular and consistent ways in which they do them. Indeed, without matter knowing its own distinctive motions, she argues, perception would be impossible. She says, “[s]elf-knowledge is the ground, or fundamental cause of perception: for were there not self-knowledge, there could not be perception” (Observations, 155). In short, all material entities, which is to say all things in nature, possess knowledge. The view that all things in nature possess mind or mental properties is panpsychism, to which Cavendish is committed here.

Even so, she uses the concept of knowledge in an unusual way. When she ascribes knowledge to a rock, or to my liver for example, but she neither necessarily means that the rock or my liver have mental states like ours nor that they can perceive their environments in the same way we do. For Cavendish, the knowledge of a thing like a mirror is, indeed, conditioned by the sort of motions that constitute the mirror, the motions that make it the thing it is; as such, mirror-knowledge and mirror-perception are very different from their human analogues. Even so, the mirror’s perception and knowledge are in some ways analogous to human perception and knowledge; both involve the object’s patterning out its own matter in a way, which copies or resembles an external object. Despite this similarity between a mirror and a human, the human being is composed of matter capable of many different kinds of perception and knowledge, whereas the mirror has a very limited ability to pattern out or reflect its environment. And the human has sufficient amounts of rational spirits uniting its parts to be able to conduct rational inquiry, whereas the rational matter of a mirror is very limited indeed.

This might sound as though she is walking back her commitment to panpsychism, but in fact she is not. For these parts or degrees of matter that possess varying levels of awareness are in fact entirely intermixed together in all things. She says, “there is a double perception in all parts of nature, to wit, rational and sensitive.... I believe there is sense and reason, or sensitive and rational knowledge, not only in all creatures, but in every part of every particular creature” (Ch. 36). Thus the rock, though it possesses a great deal of duller matter, also possesses sensitive and even rational spirits within. So Cavendish says,

self-motion is the cause of all the various...actions of nature; these cannot be performed without perception: for all actions are knowing and perceptive; and, were there no perceptions, there could not possibly be any such actions: for, how should parts agree, either in generation, composition, or dissolution of composed figures, if they had no knowledge or perception of each other? (Ch. 37, 167).

In short, Cavendish’s natural philosophy is materialist, vitalist and panpsychist, as well as anti-atomist and anti-mechanist. Unlike many of her opponents who favor mathematical physics, she takes the living things—and the limited awareness of the life sciences—as a model for her natural philosophy, as evidenced in her organicism, as well as her particular use of metaphor. In other words, she agrees with Descartes and Hobbes against the occult explanations of the Scholastics, with More and Van Helmont against the reductive mechanism of Hobbes and Descartes and with Hobbes and Stoic materialism against the incorporeal principles of More and Van Helmont.

d. God

Cavendish’s views on God are puzzling. She regularly repeats that we cannot assert the existence of things that are not observable material objects in the natural world and she does so in a way that might suggest to the modern reader that she does not believe in the immortality of the soul or the existence of an immaterial God. This would likely be a mistake, however, as there are several passages where she instead explains that she does not include God in her speculations, because we cannot speak with any degree of confidence about God’s nature. Though God is mostly absent from her work in the 1650s, in the Observations she says, “there is an infinite difference between divine attributes, and natural properties; wherefore to similize [sic] our reason, will, understanding, faculties, passions and figures etc. to God, is too high a presumption, and in some manner a blasphemy” (“Further Observations”, Ch 10, 215) and “God is incomprehensible, and above nature: but inasmuch as can be known, to wit, his being [i.e., that he exists]; and that he all-powerful...eternal, infinite, omnipotent, incorporeal, individual, immovable being” (*Further Observations*, Ch 11, 216-17). This certainly suggests that she takes God to exist or, at least, that she takes questions of his existence and nature to lie largely outside of the realm of natural philosophy and instead, perhaps, to be a matter of faith alone.

Nevertheless, we might speculate on the details of her views. As mentioned above, her views on the existence of a supernatural soul seem to be in tension with her other metaphysical commitments.  Similarly, her views on the existence of an immaterial God seem similarly in tension. Interestingly, she attaches an erratum on the final page of her first work, Philosophical Fancies, apologizing to the reader for having omitted the appropriate pieties and references to God in her natural philosophical system. What is even stranger is that, when she would reprint and re-write that system in her 1656 Philosophical and Physical Opinions, she would again omit any references to God and instead include the same erratum a second time.

Even so, it is unlikely she thought of herself as an atheist. Perhaps, as some scholars have interpreted Thomas Hobbes, she simply believed that she had no business discussing the nature of God’s existence as that was not a matter of rational inquiry but mere faith. It should be noted, however, that her several discussions of fame suggest that she was not convinced that she would have an existence after her own death.

3. Political Philosophy

In addition to her substantial work on natural philosophy, Cavendish also wrote many other works in a variety of genres, from essays on social issues to poems and plays, even the fantastic utopian fiction The Blazing World. Unlike her work on natural philosophy, however, in which she sets out her views in relatively systematic ways and in philosophical treatises, her thoughts on social or political issues appear in works of fiction or in essays strongly conditioned by rhetorical devices. For example, in Orations of Divers Sorts, she speaks in a variety of voices, imagining several fictional interlocutors who present a number of positions on issues, without indicating the author’s own views. Similarly, in her fiction, she often has several characters advocate for philosophical positions, which complicates any attribution of that view we might make to the author herself. Indeed, in The Blazing World Margaret Cavendish, the Duchess of Newcastle, appears as a character, who advises the Empress of the Blazing World on how her society ought to be governed. In this case, we might feel fairly confident that the views espoused by the character of Cavendish accord with the author’s own, but such attributions should be made only tentatively. Despite the challenges presented by the genres, in which she chose to address these issues, we might still attribute certain general views to her. Among the recurring issues she addressed are aristocracy, gender and fame.

a. Religious Liberty

To see the difficulty in ascribing unambiguous views to Cavendish in these works, consider her thoughts on liberty and stability. In her 1666 fictional work The Blazing World, an Empress has allowed her subjects a degree of political liberty. Regardless of who their parents were, for example, they could now choose their own careers. Some who were born of cobblers could become scientists and others born of soldiers could become priests and so on. In the story, this newfound freedom results in a breakdown of social harmony; the old institutions, by which the society had harmoniously functioned, begin to fail, there is strife and faction, and anarchy and civil war loom. Into this situation arrives the character of Margaret Cavendish who advises the formation of a single state sponsored religion. She further instructs the Empress in architectural details, indicating that an imposing cathedral be built from a magical burning stone found in this fictional world. Made, again, by some magical device, to float above the city, with a voice issuing from the Church with booming decrees that the old ways be reinstated, with everyone being born into and retaining the stations. The character of Cavendish proposes that doing so will cow the factious citizens and make them agree, so that cobblers will beget cobblers, soldiers give rise to soldiers and so on. When the Empress executes this plan social harmony is restored. This suggests to the reader that the author Cavendish opposes the sort of political liberty (or, perhaps better, social mobility) that the Empress had allowed; the reader might also conclude that Cavendish supports the institution of a strong state Church.

Yet in her 1662 Orations of Divers Sorts, she states in one of her orations that, if the people have already adopted a variety of religious views, then the government should grant liberty of conscience—that is, freedom of religion—because doing so is the only way to maintain peace. Indeed she says explicitly there that the government should grant this liberty, because a failure to do so will result in anarchy. Then, in the next oration immediately after, she argues from a different perspective, claiming instead that liberty of conscience would lead to liberty in the state, which in turn would result in anarchy. Political liberty, she claims, undermines the rule of law, without which there can be no justice and thus there will be anarchy. Finally, she presents a third oration in defense of a middle view. There she argues that liberty of conscience is acceptable if it concerns only private devotions, but not if it disrupts the public. In other words, if their religious beliefs do neither violate any laws nor harm the public, then those beliefs are to be allowed. We might speculate that she intends this final, middle view to be taken as the author’s own, but it is not always clear, especially when, rather than presenting two views and concluding with a compromise, she instead presents six or seven different opinions, as she does on the question of whether women are equal to men. Even so, the reader may suspect that, in this case, the compromise view is closest to Cavendish’s own.

One feature that unites these varied discussions, however, is Cavendish’s fundamental commitment to the importance of political stability. In each of the above cases, she motivates her position by assuming that social and political stability must be preserved above all. All the orations, as well as the character of Cavendish in The Blazing World, seem to assume that political stability is the goal and that the sovereign ought to employ whatever means will be successful in securing it. Like Hobbes, then, Cavendish takes the primary function of the State to provide stability. This attitude recurs in her defenses of royalism and aristocracy.

b. Royalism and Aristocracy

Cavendish came from a family of royalists, served as a maid in waiting to Queen Henrietta Maria during her and Charles the Second’s exile from England at the hands of the republican revolutionaries of Cromwell and married one of Charles’s staunchest royalist supporters, William Cavendish, Duke of Newcastle. Her commitment to royalism and, more generally, to aristocracy, appears frequently in her writing. When she discusses how a country ought to be governed, she is unwavering in her view that states are best ruled by a King or Queen, who should come from the aristocracy.

One can draw an interesting analogy between her natural philosophy and her politics here. When discussing the distinction between health and illness in animals, Cavendish describes the organism as a body politic; the healthy body is one, in which each part of the body plays its role appropriately, whereas a diseased body is one, in which one or more parts are in rebellion, acting against their natures, to the detriment of the whole organism. Indeed, given her vitalism and panpsychism, she might describe disease in the human body and political unrest or rebellion in remarkably similar terms. In both cases, the whole body is composed of a variety of different parts, each with its own distinctive activity or motion. Each part knows its role, its place, in the body politic, yet each part is free to direct its motions in a way contrary to its natural activity. If a part chooses to do so, it will throw the orderly harmony of the whole out of balance. To expand upon this metaphysical account, we might say that, for Cavendish, people have certain stations—roles and places—in society from birth by nature and social harmony is achieved when the citizens conduct themselves according to their knowledge of their own distinctive activities. As long as the cobblers cobble, the soldiers defend, the judges judge and the rulers rule, social harmony will be maintained and each person can cultivate themselves accordingly.

Indeed, this seems to be one of the central features of Cavendish the character’s advice to the Empress in The Blazing World. Being a fantastical and quasi-science fictional story, The Blazing World features citizens of a variety of animal species, all sentient, capable of human language and so on. Originally, each species has their own distinctive roles, belonging to their own, species-specific guilds. It is to this world that Cavendish urges the Empress to return, one where the citizens are like different species, each with their own peculiar skills and roles received in virtue of what sorts of people their parents were. If the people of The Blazing World simply accepted the stations into which they were born, social harmony would be regained. It is difficult not to see this as a parable of the Restoration of Charles II and the English aristocracy; peace is restored to England by the return of the aristocracy. Moreover, in 1665, the year before The Blazing World was published, her family was restored their lands and her husband was advanced to Dukedom for his service to the King during the Civil Wars.

c. Gender

Cavendish is also described at times as an early feminist. To be sure, her own remarkable life as an author and philosopher leads many to take her as an exemplar; one might say she was a feminist in deed, if not always in word.

Beyond that, though, some scholars argue that her writings are feminist as well. For many of the reasons cited above, such claims can be complicated. Consider the seven orations on women in her Orations of Divers Sorts. There she presents seven speeches that take up a variety of positions. She begins by lamenting the fact that men possess all the power and women entirely lack it. In a subsequent oration, she speculates that women lack power in society, due to natural inferiority. She then counters in the next oration that women might be able to achieve as much as men were they given the opportunity to engage in traditionally masculine activities. But the next speaker claims that, were women to imitate men in this way, they would become “hermaphroditical.” Instead, this orator suggests, women should cultivate feminine virtues such as chastity and humility. In the very next oration, however, the orator suggests that feminine virtues are inferior to masculine, so women should pursue masculine virtues instead. She concludes the series of orations on this topic with a new position, arguing that women are in fact superior to men because women, through their beauty, can control men.

What is the reader to make of this series of orations? It seems likely that Cavendish affirms the following empirical facts about her society: women lack power; women could gain fame and even perhaps power if they pursued masculine virtues; they might even be equally capable as men in cultivating these virtues; yet women would be despised if they did pursue these virtues; if women cultivated feminine virtues, they would not be despised and could even acquire a kind of indirect power, but such a state of affairs is ultimately inferior to the power men possess. What is less clear is whether Cavendish really believes that the pursuit of so-called masculine virtues would somehow harm women by causing them to deny their natures. In other words, it is not clear from these orations whether Cavendish thinks women are naturally inferior to men. In her earlier Worlds Olio, on the other hand, she seems less ambivalent, claiming that women are in general inferior to men at rhetoric. Some women may cultivate skill in rhetoric to rival and even exceed that of men, but they are few, she claims, in this work.

Some readers might point to The Blazing World, and to the power of the Empress or the success of the character of Cavendish as a political adviser. It is true that the Empress leads her people in a successful naval battle, defeating a mortal enemy of her homeland. A similar event occurs in her story Bell in Campo. Even so, the considerations above suggest that social harmony is restored because she returns to aristocratic values. After all, the notion that a woman might lead an empire, even into war, would not be so foreign to an English subject in the 1660s, given that Queen Elizabeth ruled just a few decades before and had overseen the important naval defeat of the Spanish Armada.

From her first work and throughout her career, Cavendish engaged the issue of women in her writing, reflecting on her own experience as a woman and how, or whether, it shaped her writing or philosophy. Thus, with her impressive life and regular consideration of the relevance of gender to her thought, Cavendish can be seen as an important precursor for later more explicitly feminist writers, even if she herself might not be aptly so described.

4. References and Further Reading

(Formater: Insert paragraphs for this section here.)

a. Cavendish’s Works in the 17th Century

Only the first publication is listed for each work; Cavendish revised and reprinted several of her works multiple times over the years. So, for example, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy first appeared in 1666 but reappeared, with the addition of The Blazing World, in 1668. And Grounds of Natural Philosophy is a substantially revised version of her earlier Philosophical and Physical Opinions, itself, which contained her early Philosophical Fancies as its first part.

  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical Fancies, London: printed by Thomas Roycroft for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1653.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, The World's Olio, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1655.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical and Physical Opinions, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1655.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Nature’s Pictures, London: printed for J. Martin and J. Allestrye, 1656.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Plays, London: printed for J. Martin, J. Allestrye and T. Dicas, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Orations of Divers Sorts, Accommodated to Divers Places, London: printed by W. Wilson, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, ‘Bell in Campo’, in Playes, London: J. Martin, J. Allestrye and T. Dicas, 1662.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Sociable Letters, London: printed by William Wilson, 1664.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Philosophical Letters, London: possibly printed by David Maxwell, 1664.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy, London: printed by Anne Maxwell, 1666.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1666.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Life of William, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1667.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Grounds of Natural Philosophy, London: printed by A. Maxwell, 1668.

b. Modern Editions of Her Works

  • Cavendish, Margaret, The Description Of A New World, Called The Blazing World And Other Writings, ed, Kate Lilley. London: William Pickering, 1992.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Paper Bodies: A Margaret Cavendish Reader, eds. Sylvia Bowerbank and Sara Mendelson. Peterborough, ON: Broadview Press, 2000.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Observations upon Experimental Philosophy, ed. Eileen O'Neill. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Cavendish, Margaret, Margaret Cavendish: Political Writings, ed. Susan James. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.

c. Secondary Literature

  • Battigelli, Anna, 1998, Margaret Cavendish and The Exiles of the Mind, Lexington: The University Press of Kentucky.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s life and works from a scholar of English literature, with discussions on genre and rhetorical devices in her works.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2006,“Fame, Virtue, and Government: Margaret Cavendish on Ethics and Politics,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 67: 251–289.
    • One of the few discussions of Cavendish’s ethics, with a productive focus on fame.
  • Boyle, Deborah, 2013, “Margaret Cavendish on Gender, Nature, and Freedom,” Hypatia 28 (3): 516-532.
    •  An excellent account of the complexities of Cavendish on gender.
  • Broad, Jacqueline, 2002, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • This text contains a chapter on Cavendish.
  • Clucas, Stephen, 1994, “The Atomism of the Cavendish Circle: A Reappraisal,” The Seventeenth Century, 9: 247–273.
    • Clucas argues that Cavendish never really gave up atomism.
  • Cunning, David, 2006, “Cavendish on the Intelligibility of the Prospect of Thinking Matter,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 23: 117–136.
    • A discussion of Cavendish and the notion of thinking matter, with connections to contemporary philosophy of mind.
  • Cunning, David, 2010, “Margaret Lucas Cavendish,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2006, “Atomism, Monism, and Causation in the Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish,” in Daniel Garber and Steven Nadler (eds.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, 3: 199–240
    • A long and thorough exploration of some themes in Cavendish’s metaphysics. She refutes Clucas on atomism and provides an insightful analysis on causation.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2007, “Reason and Freedom: Margaret Cavendish on the Order and Disorder of Nature,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 89: 157–191.
    • Detlefsen notes that matter itself must be free of necessity, in order to explain the disorder in nature that Cavendish allows for, especially in disease, in part via a ‘body politic’ analogy.
  • Detlefsen, Karen, 2009, “Margaret Cavendish on the Relationship Between God and World,” Philosophy Compass, 4: 421–438.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s views on God.
  • Duncan, Stewart, 2013, “Cavendish and the Divine, Supernatural, Immaterial Soul,” The Mod Squad: A Group Blog in Modern Philosophy, Accessed November 4, 2014.
    • A discussion and consideration of the nature and role of the supernatural soul in Cavendish’s metaphysics.
  • Duncan, Stewart, 2012, “Debating Materialism: Cavendish, Hobbes, and More,” History of Philosophy Quarterly 29 (4): 391-409.
    • An analysis of Cavendish that clarifies and contextualizes her materialism vis-à-vis Hobbes and More, with whom her thought shares some important similarities.
  • Hutton, Sarah, 1997, “In Dialogue with Thomas Hobbes: Margaret Cavendish's natural philosophy,” Women's Writing, 4: 421–432.
    • Cavendish’s debt, and response, to Hobbes’s metaphysics.
  • James, Susan, 1999, “The Philosophical Innovations of Margaret Cavendish,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 7: 219–244.
    • An excellent overview of the major themes in Cavendish’s metaphysics.
  • James, Susan, 2003, “Introduction,” in Margaret Cavendish: Political Writings, ed. Susan James, Cambridge: Cambridge UP (2003).
    • An overview of Cavendish’s social and political themes.
  • Kroetsch, Cameron, 2013, “List of Margaret Cavendish’s Texts, Printers, and Booksellers,” The Digital Cavendish Project, Accessed November 4, 2014.
    • A detailed account of the printing and publishing of Cavendish’s works.
  • Lascano, Marcy. “An Introduction to Margaret Cavendish, or ‘Why You Should Include Margaret Cavendish in Your Early Modern Course and Buy the Book.’” The Mod Squad, A Group Blog in Early Modern Philosophy. Accessed July 14, 2014.
    •  Lascano makes a compelling case for the inclusion of Cavendish in Early Modern Philosophy survey courses.
  • Lewis, Eric, 2001, “The Legacy of Margaret Cavendish,” Perspective on Science, 9: 341–365.
    • An overview of Cavendish’s reception, both among her contemporaries and ours. Valuable in part for its identification of lacunae in recent scholarship.
  • Michaelian, Kourken, 2009, “Margaret Cavendish's Epistemology,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 17: 31–53.
    • The only extended discussion of Cavendish’s epistemology, with a special focus on her distinction of internal and external knowledge.
  • O'Neill, Eileen, 1998, “Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and Their Fate in History,” in Janet A. Kourany (ed.), Philosophy in a Feminist Voice, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • The locus classicus for discussion of the way in which women philosophers were written out of histories in the past two centuries.
  • O'Neill, Eileen, 2001, “Introduction,” in Margaret Cavendish, Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy, Eileen O'Neill (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, x-xxxvi.
    • An excellent account of Cavendish’s mature thought, in what is arguably her greatest work.
  • Sarasohn, Lisa, 2010, The Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish: Reason and Fancy During the Scientific Revolution, Baltimore, MA: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
    • An examination of Cavendish’s natural philosophy by an historian of science.
  • Whitaker, Katie, 2002, Mad Madge: The Extraordinary Life of Margaret CavendishDuchess of Newcastle, the First Woman to Live by Her Pen, New York: Basic Books.
    • An entertaining biography of Cavendish.

Author Information

Eugene Marshall
Florida International University
U. S. A.

Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716)

LeibnizWidely hailed as a universal genius, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz was one of the most important thinkers of the late 17th and early 18th centuries. A polymath and one of the founders of calculus, Leibniz is best known philosophically for his metaphysical idealism; his theory that reality is composed of spiritual, non-interacting “monads,” and his oft-ridiculed thesis that we live in the best of all possible worlds. Though these ideas may make his philosophy seem exceedingly abstract, Leibniz had keen interest in less abstract fields, such as empirical physics and jurisprudence. He also made great contributions to logic, with some considering him the greatest logician since Aristotle.

Due to his belief in a rationally ordered universe, his commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, and his acceptance of innate ideas, Leibniz is rightly ranked along with Descartes and Spinoza as one of the seminal early modern rationalists. Leibniz stands out in this tradition, however, for his novel efforts to find compatibility between classical and modern thought. He retained ancient and scholastic notions such as substantial form and final cause, while at the same time attempting to improve upon the mechanical philosophies of Hobbes, Spinoza, and Descartes. He also hoped his comprehensive philosophical system would serve as a common ground for uniting the determinedly divided Christian denominations in Europe. Such irenic pursuits make Leibniz a unique transitional figure in the history of philosophy. He has been called both the last in the lineage of great Christian Platonists and the first thinker to tackle the intellectual problems of modern Europe. After an introduction to his life and works, this article will examine the key elements of Leibniz’s ambitious philosophical program.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Writings
  2. Key Principles
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Substantial Forms
    2. Substance as Complete Concept
    3. Causality and Pre-Established Harmony
    4. Idealism
    5. The Nature of Body
    6. Efficient and Final Causality
  4. Theodicy
    1. Leibniz’s Project
    2. God
    3. Possible Worlds and Optimism
    4. Freedom and Necessity
  5. Epistemology
    1. Ideas and Knowledge
    2. Innate Ideas
    3. Petites Perceptions
    4. Reflection, Memory, Selfhood
  6. Ethics
    1. Intellect and Will
    2. Justice and Charity
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources: Leibniz Texts and Translations
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Introductory Texts
      2. More Advanced Studies
      3. Collected Essays

1. Life and Writings

Leibniz was born on 1 July 1646, during the waning years of the Thirty Years’ War, in the Lutheran town of Leipzig. His father, Friedrich, was professor of moral philosophy at the University in Leipzig. His mother, Catherina Schmuck, was the daughter of a law professor. Leibniz grew up in an educated, and by all accounts, orthodox Lutheran environment. Between the books of his father, those of his maternal grandfather, and the contributions of Friedrich’s bookselling former father-in-law, Leibniz had access to an impressive library. At a young age, he gained a love for classical literature and the writings of the Church Fathers.

From 1661-63, Leibniz pursued university studies in Leipzig, with a brief stay at the university in Jena in 1663. At the time, the curriculum at these universities was still largely scholastic with some pedagogical practices bearing traces of the Ramist encyclopedic tradition. Leibniz’s main teachers, Jakob Thomasius in Leipzig and Erhard Weigel in Jena, were Aristotelians with eclectic interests. Leibniz had his own eclectic interests, having gained some, mostly second-hand, familiarity with modern mechanical philosophy. Later in his life, he recounted a fateful stroll through the Rosental in Leipzig in which he debated the respective merits of scholastic and modern thinking. “Mechanism finally prevailed,” he recalled, “and led me to apply myself to mathematics” (G III, 606). Though steeped in classical and scholastic learning, Leibniz at quite a young age fashioned himself a man of the times.

Leibniz went on to pursue a degree in law, earning his doctorate from the University in Altdorf in 1666. His writings from his student years include his bachelor’s dissertation, A Metaphysical Disputation on the Principle of Individuation, an early work in combinatorial logic titled A Dissertation on the Art of Combinations, and works on legal theory.

After short stints in Nuremburg and Frankfurt, Leibniz took his first major employment in the Catholic court of the Prince-Archbishop of Mainz, Johann Philipp von Schӧnborn in 1668. Leibniz was tasked with reforming legal codes and statutes. During his time in Mainz, Leibniz struck up an important relationship with Baron Johann Christian von Boineburg, the central statesman in the Mainz court. Boineburg appreciated Leibniz’s considerable talents and set before him the task of solving the day’s most pressing philosophical and theological questions. Through his association with Boineburg, Leibniz began to see the challenges modern philosophy, especially the materialism of Gassendi and Hobbes, posed to belief in the immortality of the soul, to belief in God and natural law, and to both Catholic and Lutheran understandings of the Eucharist. Leibniz thus from 1668-70 began working on a number of preliminary studies meant to be part of a comprehensive work entitled Catholic Demonstrations. Though this dreamed-of magnum opus never materialized, Leibniz never abandoned his goal of developing a modern philosophy congenial to Christian theology. In addition to his Catholic Demonstrations writings, Leibniz’s Elements of Natural Law, written between 1669 and 1671, also contributed to these efforts. Furthermore, during this period Leibniz intensified his interest in physics, writing the Theory of Abstract Motion and the New Physical Hypothesis, and penning an unanswered letter to Thomas Hobbes on the Englishman’s physical theory as it relates to the philosophy of mind. Leibniz in hindsight found these youthful physical works unimpressive, but they attest to the diversity of his interests.

Mainz opened Leibniz to an extraordinarily broad range of philosophical concerns; his most intense period of intellectual development soon followed. In 1672, Leibniz was dispatched to Paris on a diplomatic mission as well as on personal business for Boineburg. Paris exposed Leibniz to learning, resources, and interlocutors the likes of which he had never seen. He had access to the unpublished writings of Descartes and Pascal. He met with leading Parisian intellectuals Antoine Arnauld and Nicholas Malebranche. He studied mathematics under the Dutch mathematician Christiaan Huygens. He twice visited London, in 1673 and 1676, meeting with the mathematicians and physicists of the Royal Society. Leibniz’s friend Walther von Tschirnhaus, though forbidden from showing Leibniz an advanced copy, apprised Leibniz of many of the contents of Spinoza’s Ethics. This led Leibniz, upon leaving Paris in 1676, to make an excursion to The Hague to visit Spinoza.

Paris and London offered Leibniz the opportunity to establish himself as a rising star in the European intellectual orbit and Leibniz did not squander his chance. By 1675 he had developed the infinitesimal calculus, only three years after he started the serious study of contemporary mathematics. He also continued to write on a wide range of philosophical topics. His Confession of a Philosopher of 1672-3 was his first response to the problem of evil and to the question of determinism. His most important collection of metaphysical papers from the period, De summa rerum, contains some of Leibniz’s early responses to Spinoza’s monism, with budding reflections on the relationship between mind and body, on the nature of the continuum, and on universal harmony.

In 1676, Leibniz accepted a position in the court of Duke Johann Friedrich of Hanover, employed mainly to serve as court librarian and to consult on engineering projects in the Harz mines. After his taste of the intellectual scenes in Paris and London, Leibniz found life in Hanover a disappointment. Despite his lack of professional prospects, Leibniz would in the ensuing decade sharpen his intellectual vision. He published a number of important essays on mathematics, epistemology, and physics in the new journal Acta Eruditorum. In 1686, while it snowed in the Harz, Leibniz composed “a little discourse on metaphysics.” Now published without the diminutive “little,” the Discourse on Metaphysics is widely considered Leibniz’s first mature philosophical statement. Leibniz sent a summary of the Discourse to Arnauld, sparking an extended and illuminating correspondence between them on issues of freedom, causality, and occasionalism.

In 1689, Leibniz travelled to Italy on official business, researching possible ancestral ties to the Guelf Dukes of Hanover. Leibniz, never one to let official duties interfere with his own intellectual agenda, used the opportunity to pitch his metaphysics to leading Catholic intellectuals. He also wrote works on cosmology in efforts to exonerate the Copernican system from Vatican censure.

Leibniz returned in 1690 to Hanover, which remained his home base until his death. Leibniz continued to write prodigiously and we can mention here only a small sample of his works. 1695 saw the publication of the first part of his Specimen of Dynamics and his New System of Nature. The former work included Leibniz’s reflections on the nature of force, and in many ways was developed in response to Newton’s Principia Mathematica; the latter was Leibniz’s first public presentation of his theory of pre-established harmony. In 1703, Leibniz began work on The New Essays on Human Understanding, a book-length dialogue in response to Locke’s Essay on Human Understanding. The only book Leibniz published during his lifetime, the Theodicy, was released in 1710. In this work, Leibniz defends his thesis that we live in best of all possible worlds and defends the reasonableness of Christianity against the fideism and skepticism of Pierre Bayle. In 1714, Leibniz wrote the Monadology, the last comprehensive summary statement of his philosophical views.

Throughout his years in Hanover, Leibniz maintained a stunning number of epistolary correspondents. Notable among these were Samuel Clark, Burchard de Volder, Johann Bernoulli, Bartholomew Des Bosses, and Christian Wolff. Leibniz also corresponded and often met with Sophie, Electress of Hanover, and her daughter Sophie Charlotte, Queen of Prussia. These women encouraged, and in many ways made possible, Leibniz’s philosophical pursuits while employed at the court.

Leibniz’s final years were clouded by charges that he stole ideas from the papers of Isaac Newton when developing the calculus in the 1670s. Leibniz has been cleared of the charges and it is now accepted that the two men developed the calculus independently. Leibniz died on 14 November 1716 after struggles with gout and arthritis.

Unlike the other major philosophical lights of his era, and despite having written more than any of them, Leibniz produced no magnum opus. He seemed most at home in dialogue, in correspondence, and in controversy. The Discourse on Metaphysics and Monadology are his most commonly studied works in metaphysics. Scholars disagree about the extent to which the two works are in accord, but they together provide a solid grounding in Leibniz’s thought. The Theodicy is a classic of philosophical theology and the New Essays provides the fullest account of Leibniz’s epistemology. This article will summarize Leibniz’s philosophy mainly as it is presented in these works. It would be a mistake, however, to think that one can get a full picture of Leibniz’s interests from these works and the reader is encouraged to consult the many excellent edited selections of Leibniz’s texts.

2. Key Principles

Several key principles form the core of Leibniz’s philosophy. Though Leibniz never lists these serially in the manner of, for instance, the axioms of Spinoza’s Ethics, the principles nonetheless shape Leibniz’s thinking and ground his major claims. He refers to them throughout his writings and we shall refer to them throughout our discussion. Though each of these principles merits further analysis in its own right, we introduce them only briefly here. Truly unique to Leibniz is not so much these principles in themselves as the use to which he collectively puts them.

In the Monadology, Leibniz writes that we reason “based on two great principles” (M 30). The first of these is the principle of contradiction, which deems every contradiction to be false. Classically stated, the principle of contradiction holds that something cannot be both “x” and “not x” at the same time and in the same respect. Aristotle claimed that all logic and reasoning presupposes the principle of contradiction and Leibniz sees no reason to think otherwise.

The second great principle of reason is the principle of sufficient reason, “by virtue of which we consider that we can find no true or existent fact, no true assertion, without there being a sufficient reason why it is thus and not otherwise, although most of these reasons cannot be known to us” (M 31). The classical statement of the principle of sufficient reason is nihil sine ratione: there is nothing without reason or cause. Leibniz holds that every state of affairs has an explanation, even if we must admit that we often do not have sufficient information to provide an explanation. The principle of sufficient reason assumes great prominence in Leibniz’s philosophy, most notably in his accounts of substance, causality, freedom, and optimism.

Closely related to the principle of sufficient reason is the principle of the best. This principle holds that rational beings always choose, and act for, the best. In this way, reason is teleologically ordered towards goodness. On Leibniz’s thinking, if reason did not opt for what is best, it would act arbitrarily; it would not have a sufficient reason for choosing one option over another, thus violating reason’s second great principle. Goodness provides the sufficient reason for rational choice. The principle of the best manifests itself differently in the cases of God and created minds. God, whom Leibniz considers “an absolutely perfect being” (DM 1), and who thus knows what is best, always acts in the best way. Created minds, who have a finite degree of perfection and thus limited knowledge of what is best, always act according to what seems the best from their limited perspectives.

The predicate-in-notion principle provides Leibniz’s notion of truth: praedicatum inest subjecto. In any true, affirmative proposition the predicate is contained in the subject. In order for the proposition, “Leibniz is a mathematician,” to be true, the idea “mathematician” must somehow be included in the idea “Leibniz.” Leibniz’s interpretation of the predicate-in-notion principle, we shall see, has far-reaching consequences for his metaphysics. Somewhat relatedly, Leibniz affirms the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, which states that any two objects sharing all properties are in fact the same, identical object. Each individual object contains some individuating characteristic. Important for Leibniz, this individuating characteristic must be something intrinsic to the individual, and not simply a separation in space and time, which Leibniz considers purely extrinsic denominations. The principle of the identity of indiscernibles is tied closely to the predicate-in-notion principle insofar as the latter makes intrinsic properties the basis of all truth and the former makes such properties the basis for identity and individuation.

A final key principle worth noting is the principle of continuity. “Nothing takes place suddenly, and it is one of my great principles that nature never makes leaps,” Leibniz writes in the New Essays. “I call this the Law of continuity” (NE 56). All change is continuous; there is never a leap, but rather a series of intervening stages. This principle is especially germane to Leibniz’s development of the infinitesimal calculus, but relevant too to his metaphysics and epistemology.

3. Metaphysics

a. Substantial Forms

One of the earliest intellectual projects Leibniz set for himself was to determine the proper relationship between the Aristotelian philosophy taught at his university in Leipzig and the new, mechanical philosophy espoused by thinkers like Galileo, Descartes, and Hobbes. Leibniz embraces modern, mechanical physics as the proper method for investigating nature, yet he is distinctive among 17th century thinkers for the depths of his efforts to retain several key metaphysical concepts of ancient and medieval philosophy. Chief among these concepts is the Aristotelian idea of substantial form. Though Leibniz does not adopt the traditional understanding of substantial form in its details, his grappling with the legitimacy of this notion sets the trajectory for much of his metaphysics.

Aristotle, with the medieval scholastics following him, argues that any individual thing consists of a substantial form, which determines the kind of thing it is, and matter, which individuates the thing and makes it numerically distinct from other like substances. So, a particular squirrel consists of the universal form “squirrel” shaping and directing particular material stuff. In the 17th century, the idea that substantial forms should enter into physical accounts of nature becomes especially odious. Citing “squirrelness,” the moderns maintain, tells us nothing regarding the activity of a squirrel. For thinkers such as Hobbes and Descartes, substantial forms are useless fictions, at best superfluous and at worst misleading. The mathematically-based, mechanical laws governing matter in motion suffice to explain the whole of nature, with no need to take into account the kind of thing under investigation. What counts in describing the behavior of a squirrel is not its “squirrelness,” but the forces its limbs exert on one another, the pressure differentials in its circulatory system, and other quantifiable data. This approach makes it possible to have a single method for investigating all natural phenomena.

Leibniz agrees that substantial forms have no use in physics, but he insists metaphysical accounts of reality require something like substantial forms. Mechanical explanation adequately addresses the activity of the physical world, but not its underlying nature. For Leibniz, the corporeal world its very essence depends on incorporeal principles. Both Hobbes’ purely materialist metaphysics and the strict substance-dualism of Descartes fail to properly appreciate nature’s dependence on purely metaphysical entities. Ultimately, Leibniz’s defense of substantial forms provides the first step in the development of his idealist metaphysics.

Leibniz offers several defenses of substantial forms, in which he tries not to revive Aristotle’s notion of form wholesale, so much as to prove the existence of irreducible, incorporeal entities. One argument turns on the principle of sufficient reason: the fact that the corporeal world itself cannot offer any explanation for its particular features. Why does a given body occupy so much space, have a particular shape, or move in just this way? By limiting oneself to mechanical explanation, one can either say that body A’s features were caused by body B, or one can say that body A has had its particular constitution from eternity. The former approach leads to an infinite regress in explanation, which is to say it never arrives at an explanation at all. There is always yet another body requiring explanation. The latter approach, for Leibniz, likewise offers no real explanation. Citing eternity as a reason, he feels, amounts to answering the question “Why is A, x?” with “Simply because A is x and always has been x,” dodging the question. Since the corporeal world does not contain sufficient explanation for its own features, Leibniz concludes that the cause of such features lies in incorporeal principles.

In a second defense of incorporeal substantial principles, Leibniz denies the Cartesian distinction between the primary qualities of bodies and secondary qualities such as color and temperature (DM 12). Descartes, anticipating Locke, argues that the secondary qualities of bodies are relative to the perceiving subject. For instance, as we observe in cases of color-blindness, one person perceives an object as red and another person the same object as green. Color, the argument goes, is thus not a property of the body itself, but depends on the interaction between object and perceiver. Descartes holds, however, that size, shape, and motion are not relative properties, but constitute the essence of body itself. Leibniz, believing that space and time are relative, counters that these primary properties which depend on space and time, and also include something relative to perception. No perceived material quality, therefore, accounts for what a body essentially is. It follows that incorporeal principles must be the real metaphysical building blocks of reality.

A third argument for substantial forms comes in Leibniz’s treatment of force. Descartes had confused force with what we would call momentum. He measured force by multiplying mass by velocity, not by acceleration, or the square of velocity. For Leibniz, this error on the part of Descartes points to an important fact about reality. Motion, measured by mv, is relative. When several objects change positions, one cannot with certainty attribute motion to one object or another. Force, however, has more reality. We have sufficient reason to attribute it to one body over others. In other words, we have more certainty which body in a system is the proximate cause of changes in other bodies. Force, therefore, has more reality than motion, and yet force is not corporeal in the way both mass and velocity are since force is not extended. Though Descartes’ confusion seems simply an error in calculation, in it Leibniz sees additional indication that the realities grounding corporeal objects are not themselves corporeal.

b. Substance as Complete Concept

Though his defense of incorporeal substances allows Leibniz to partially reconcile pre-modern and modern thought, Leibniz still needs to articulate his own account of the nature of these substances. In §8 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz takes up the task of defining individual substance. He begins with Aristotle’s definition, which states that when many things are said of a subject, yet it is said of nothing else, this subject is rightly called an individual substance. So, for instance, we say of Alexander the Great that he is Macedonian and ambitious, but we do not say of anything else that it is Alexander the Great. Thus, Alexander is an individual substance.

Leibniz deems this Aristotelian definition of substance merely logical. It tells us something about the structure of thought and language, but does not provide a metaphysical account of substance. To move to a proper metaphysical understanding, Leibniz believes we must look more closely at the nature of predication. “All true predication,” he writes, “has some basis in the nature of things.” Here, Leibniz shows his belief that there is isomorphism between metaphysics and logic. All true propositions have an ontological basis. All we can truly say of Alexander the Great is included in Alexander’s nature.

The idea that each substance includes all the predicates which belong to it is, Leibniz takes it, simply a metaphysical restatement of the predicate-in-notion principle. On the basis of this principle, Leibniz arrives at his notion of substance as a complete concept:

The nature of an individual substance or of a complete being is to have a notion so complete that it is sufficient to contain and to allow us to deduce from it all the predicates of the subject to which the notion is attributed. (DM 8)

Leibniz’s thought is essentially this: if one had a sufficiently powerful intellect, one could deduce from the idea of any individual substance all that could ever be said of it, in just the same way that if one has a clear and distinct idea of a circle, one can deduce all the properties of a circle. From the very concept of Alexander the Great, the infinite intellect of God can deduce all Alexander’s qualities, including that he is the vanquisher of Darius. To be a substance, then, is to have such a corresponding complete concept. Every substance, as it were, includes its biography.

Beginning in the 1690s, “monad” becomes Leibniz’s preferred term for a complete, incorporeal, individual substance. The term monad derives from the Greek mónos, meaning alone or solitary. Leibniz introduces the term to underscore the fact that individual substances are not only complete, but also simple. As Leibniz’s defense of substantial forms showed, the material realm needs grounding in something incorporeal. Matter, however, can be infinitely divided. Leibniz therefore reasons that there must be infinite simple monads populating the world at even the most infinitesimal levels. Leibniz likens the fullness and complexity of the monadic universe to “nested” ponds and gardens.

Each portion of matter can be conceived as a garden full of plants, and as a pond full of fish. But each branch of a plant, each limb of an animal, each drop of its humors, is still another such garden or pond. (M 67)

Monads are thus “spiritual atoms,” the incorporeal building blocks of all reality. They are the complete entities which merit the designation “substance.”

It is in the nature of each monad to have its own internal principle of activity. As Leibniz writes, “activity is of the essence of substance in general” (NE 65). Beginning in the 1690s, Leibniz refers to the internal activity of substances as their primitive active forces. Defining substance in terms of activity is important to Leibniz for several reasons. For one, this position is of a piece with his contention that the activity of corporeal entities is grounded in that of incorporeal entities. In order to play this role, incorporeal monads must themselves be active. More importantly, Leibniz broaches the discussion of substance in the Discourse on Metaphysics with the goal of differentiating the actions of God from those of creatures. In arguing that each substance has its own primitive active force, Leibniz distances himself both from Spinoza’s monism and Malebranche’s occasionalism, the former holding that individual things are not themselves substances but rather modes of a single divine substance, and the latter invoking God’s power to explain the ordinary doings of creatures. To Leibniz, each of these positions insufficiently appreciates that each substance is complete and active in itself. For, were created substances to lack activity, there would be no distinction between actual, created substances and the possible yet uncreated substances in God’s mind, a modal distinction central to Leibniz’s theodicy.

c. Causality and Pre-Established Harmony

If each substance is complete in itself and requires no other substance to be understood, it follows that every finite substance is causally independent of all save God. Each created substance is, as Leibniz says, “like a world apart” (DM 14). But how can this be? How can Alexander defeat Darius without being related to, and thus in a sense dependent on, Darius? More broadly, how can Leibniz square his “world apart” language with our experience of living in a world with a plethora of cause and effect relationships between substances?

Leibniz responds to these questions by offering a unique theory of causal interaction, which he calls at different points either the theory of pre-established harmony or the hypothesis of concomitance. The theory holds that although no two substances directly influence each other, they can express each other, that is, the activity of one can be reflected in the concept of the other. Alexander, we typically say, caused Darius’ death. Leibniz does not object to this kind of causal attribution, but insists that at the metaphysical level, what we call causality amounts to no more than this: it is in the nature of Alexander to be he who defeats Darius and it is likewise in the nature of Darius to be him defeated by Alexander. These two independent substances, as Leibniz puts it, “mirror” each other, so that at the exact moment it can be predicated of Alexander that he is the vanquisher of Darius, it can likewise be predicated of Darius that he is the victim of Alexander.

Hence, although each substance is “like a world apart,” substances form a common world by mirroring, or expressing, one another. God ordains at the moment of creation—in Leibniz’s terms he “preestablishes”—that the perceptions of all creatures in the world harmonize with one another, that there is strict alignment so that at the moment I perceive myself as tapping my friend on the shoulder, she perceives herself as being tapped. Leibniz is fond of likening the relationship between substances to that between two perfectly synchronized clocks which remain aligned despite never touching each other. Causal interaction is no more than what we find in these clocks, the harmonized activity of independent entities. Leibniz famously describes independent monads as “windowless,” neither letting in any outside influence nor issuing any influence (M 7). This is the Leibnizian universe: windowless monads in pre-established harmony.

The theory of pre-established harmony includes the rather strong claim that each substance is harmonized with all other substances in the world. This must be the case if the substances are to form a common world with a common history, since mutual expression is the only possible relation between independent substances. Does this mean that my concept expresses the nature of even a fish living thousands of years ago? In a word, yes. Though Alexander and Darius express each other much more distinctly than I express the ancient fish, my concept must bear traces of the existence of that fish since we are members of a common world. This might seem fantastical, even absurd, but if one considers how much one’s own experience reflects the activities and efforts of one’s predecessors, and how much their activities were constrained by their natural environment, then perhaps one can begin to appreciate Leibniz’s insight that every single substance bears traces of, or faintly expresses, the whole universe, past, present, and future.

Leibniz’s explanation of causality via pre-established harmony and mutual expression has led some commentators to accuse Leibniz of what they call the “mirroring problem.” They object that if substance A expresses the essence of all others, yet these in turn express substance A, then the world is like a hall of mirrors which reflect one another but no concrete images. In this scenario, the concept of any given substance is not complete, as Leibniz would hold, but empty. Although this line of objection points to some of the complexities and potential difficulties in the theory of pre-established harmony, it merits mention that Leibniz sees each substance as fundamentally mirroring God. “It can even be said that every substance bears in some way the character of God’s infinite wisdom and omnipotence and imitates him as much as it is capable” (DM 9). Stating that each substance reflects God’s essence, while also mirroring all other substances, does not directly respond to the mirroring problem. Noting that each substance reflects God’s essence by virtue of its own internal individuating activity perhaps provides a more satisfying response, and it is likely that Leibniz’s solution to the mirroring problem lies in this direction.

d. Idealism                                                                      

Leibniz’s defense of incorporeal monads as the foundation of the physical world, his notion of substance as a complete concept, and his account of causality via pre-established harmony all contribute to Leibniz’s brand of idealism. By idealism, we mean the thesis that nothing exists in the world but minds and their ideas. As Leibniz summarizes his idealism: “There is nothing in the world but simple substances and in them perception and appetite” (AG 181).

By perception, Leibniz means the “passing state which involves and represents a multitude in the unity or in the simple substance” (M 14). Since each substance is metaphysically complete in itself and “like a world apart,” all changes in its state arise spontaneously, that is, without the intervention of other substances. Yet since each substance mirrors all others, it must contain a multiplicity of representations within itself. The sequence of spontaneous representations is what Leibniz calls perception. Importantly, Leibniz posits that all beings in the world perceive. This is yet another consequence of the fact that mutual representation is the only relation between monads in pre-established harmony. What distinguishes rational, conscious minds from all other substances is not perception, but apperception, or the ability to reflect on their mental processes.

Of appetite, Leibniz writes: “The action of the internal principle which brings about the change or passage from one perception to another can be called appetition; it is true that the appetite cannot always completely reach the whole perception toward which it tends, but it always obtains something of it. And reaches new perceptions” (M 15). The best analogy here is perhaps a mathematical function, where appetite is the analogue to the function equation, or the law of the series, and where each perception represents a discrete value. Leibniz’s point is that each substance has an orientation which defines it and which governs the transition between perceptions. This does not mean that each individual can fully choose or determine the sequence of its perceptions, since it is constrained by the need to faithfully represent the activity of other substances. Appetite does indicate, however, that there is a striving or tendency unique to each substance which shapes the manner in which it reflects the world. Hence Leibniz describes substances as so many distinct “viewpoints” on the universe (DM 14; M 57).

In composite substances, such as living animals whose various parts contribute to the well-being of the entire organism, simple monads unite under the direction of a dominant monad (M 70). Each monad retains its substantial independence, but living organisms display an especially high level of intermonadic harmony. Though Leibniz does not define in detail the operations of dominant monads, these monads must at least subsume others under their own internal principles or appetites. The activity of subordinate monads thereby serves the goals of the dominant monad. Conversely, subordinate monads must have particularly strong bearing on the perceptions of dominant monads, being, as it were, extensions of it. “There is nothing in the world but simple substances, and in them perception and appetite” may sound like a simple statement, but its simplicity should not mask the manifold degrees of coordination between the perceptions and appetites of monads.

e. The Nature of Body

It follows from Leibniz’s idealism that bodies are phenomenal. In other words, the physical world is the perception of perceiving monads. Leibniz is at pains, however, to insist that his system makes bodies “well-founded phenomena” (phenomena bene fundata). By this Leibniz means that bodies are not arbitrary perceptions lacking veracity. The pre-established harmony among all substances establishes a common realm of truth. Our perceptions thus provide us with knowledge of reality and serves as the starting point for empirical science.

Although “well-founded phenomena” might seem an empty expression within an idealist framework, it gains meaning from Leibniz’s commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, that is, the principle that nothing happens without reason or cause. For Leibniz, God’s rational ordering of creation certifies the reliability of sense perception, since God—the most rational of all minds—cannot do anything without having a reason for doing so. It would be arbitrary of God to give me this particular set of perceptions instead of some other set if it were not the case that my perceptions have some basis in other existing substances (NE 56). The thoroughgoing rational design of the world ensures that my perceptions indeed reflect the true order of things.

Defining bodies as “well-founded phenomena” leaves open the question of the relation of an individual’s mind to his own body. After all, my experience of my body seems qualitatively different than my perception of other things in the world. My arm, for example, moves upwards when I wish to remove my hat. Other bodies do not respond to my will in a like manner. Leibniz again invokes his theory of pre-established harmony to explain this apparent interaction between one’s mental and bodily states.

When I wish to raise my arm, it is precisely at the moment when everything is arranged in the body so as to carry this out, in such a manner that the body moves by virtue of its own laws; although it happens through the admirable but unfailing harmony between things that these things conspire towards that end precisely at the moment when the will is inclined to it, since God took it into consideration in advance, when he made his decision about the succession of all things in the universe. (LA 92)

Leibniz explains that God has arranged the world such that one’s mind and body do not directly influence each other, but nevertheless correspond perfectly at all moments. Leibniz is at pains to emphasize that the mind does not directly move the body because he wants to preserve the integrity of physics. Modern physics, relying on the principles of inertia and the conservation of force, requires that the motion of bodies be explained by other bodies. If minds directly influenced bodies, force could be added to the world at any time, and neither the principle of inertia nor the principle of conservation would hold. What causes the motion of my arm are the electrical impulses and synapses of my nervous system. The parallels between our desires and our bodily movements are instances not of interaction, but of harmony.

It is important to note that Leibniz sees the pre-established harmony between mind and body as following from his general theory of substance. Since minds are substantial and bodies phenomenal, my body is in one sense just a particularly distinct perception of my mind. In this sense, one’s perception of one’s body is not qualitatively different from one’s experience of other phenomena. Taking up Leibniz’s description of monads as various “viewpoints” on the universe, perhaps we can liken the body to one’s viewfinder, one’s lens on the universe, so long as we do not take the metaphor too literally by treating the body as an independent substance.

Though Leibniz adopts the language of “well-founded phenomena” to characterize bodies, scholars have debated the extent to which Leibniz’s idealism entails phenomenalism. The debate, put one way, is whether Leibniz makes bodies so “well-founded” that they have more reality than the term phenomena suggests. There is some consensus around the idea that Leibniz does not fully reduce bodies to perceptions, à la Berkeley, since bodies are aggregates of substantially real monads. Less certain is whether the substantial reality of monads makes labeling Leibniz a phenomenalist less apt. Given Leibniz’s insistence that “there is nothing in the world but [incorporeal] simple substances and in them perception and appetite” (AG 181) and his own use of the term phenomena, it seems most likely that Leibniz did not wish to accord bodies of aggregated monads the same metaphysical status as the monads comprising them. In short, monads are substantial, bodies are phenomenal, and Leibnizian idealism entails phenomenalism.

f. Efficient and Final Causality

Leibniz’s retrieval of the notion of substantial form blossomed into his idealist, monadic metaphysics and theory of pre-established harmony. Pre-established harmony mandates that the activity of bodies be explained by other bodies, not by minds. In explaining the activities of bodies, Leibniz makes a second major effort at reconciling ancient and modern thought. He mounts a defense of the utility of final causes in physics.

Aristotle distinguished between four causes, or four ways of accounting for the being of a thing. Philosophers of the 17th century found particularly objectionable the idea of final cause. The final cause of something indicates its purpose or goal. For instance, one might claim that the final cause of a tree is to grow upwards and reproduce. Thinkers such as Descartes, Hobbes, and Spinoza rejected the utility of final causes in explanations of the physical world, much as they rejected the utility of formal causes, or substantial forms. They restricted physics to the study of efficient causes, mechanical accounts of bodies in motion. We explain the growth of tree by looking to nutrient transfer from roots to branches, the exchange of compounds in respiration, the means of reproduction. To the moderns, any mention of tree’s purpose belongs to poetry, not physics.

Leibniz is as committed to mechanical explanation as his contemporaries, yet he bucks the 17th century trend of discrediting final causes outright. He reconciles the two approaches by offering a doctrine of double explanation. For Leibniz, events in nature are subject to explanation by either efficient or final causes. Leibniz does not adhere strictly to the Aristotelian notion of final cause any more than he adheres to the Aristotelian notion of substantial form. What Leibniz realizes, however, is that consideration of the end state of a physical process can often have as much predictive power as consideration of the motive forces involved. In §22 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz cites Fermat’s proof of the refraction law for light. Fermat derived the law by noting that light takes the easiest path, or the path of least resistance. In this sense, Fermat took note of the end or goal light rays achieve. By contrast, Descartes proved the same law solely by examining efficient causes, likening the refraction of light to bouncing tennis balls, and considering factors such as speed and mass. The refraction of light, Leibniz observes, can be explained and predicted under two separate causal paradigms.

Leibniz’s development of the calculus aids him greatly in his defense of final causes. Using what we would today call the variational calculus, Leibniz can show that change in nature happens at optimal points where the derivative vanishes. Systems thus tend towards certain end states and analyzing these states can furnish us with significant predictive power. Calculus permits Leibniz to tie discussions of final cause to mathematics, not poetics.

Although Leibniz finds both efficient and final causal explanations acceptable, he insists that they be kept separate. We ought not to invoke discussions of purpose simply when we lack a sufficient mechanical explanation. Final causes do not fill the gaps in our understanding of efficient causes; they provide another method of investigation entirely. Leibniz favors explanations by efficient causes, to be sure, as they open up great possibilities for engineering. Still, he considers either method a legitimate account of the world. Efficient causes, Leibniz likes to say, show us God’s power; final causes, by bringing to light the directedness and efficiency of nature, reveal God’s wisdom.

4. Theodicy

a. Leibniz’s Project

Leibniz ranks peace of mind as “the greatest cause of [his] philosophizing” (L 148). Central to Leibniz’s efforts to secure peace of mind is the thesis that we live in the best of all possible worlds, a position now commonly called Leibnizian optimism. Leibniz reasons that if we can assure ourselves that God acts in the best of all possible ways, then we can trust God’s justice and have true peace of mind. Of course, it is by no means self-evident that our world, which includes suffering and evil, is compatible with divine justice, nor is it self-evident what criteria could certify the world as “the best of all possible.” Leibniz thus devotes much argument to defending divine justice and coins the term “theodicy”—from the Greek words for God (theós) and justice (díkē)—to describe this project.

b. God

The thesis that God acts in the best of all possible ways follows from the notion of God as “an absolutely perfect being” (DM 1). Leibniz accepts Descartes’ ontological proof for the existence of God, which proves the existence of God by way of our idea of perfection, with one caveat. To Leibniz, Descartes leaves his proof open to the objection that God does not exist because God cannot exist. “An absolutely perfect being,” this objection posits, is a logical impossibility. So, Leibniz sets out to demonstrate that a single being can possess all perfections in a logically consistent manner. He bolsters the ontological proof by grounding the demonstration for God’s actuality in a demonstration of God’s possibility.

Leibniz clarifies what he means by “perfection” by stipulating that those properties incapable of a highest degree do not qualify as perfections. The “greatest of all numbers” is a contradiction, as is the “greatest of all figures,” since number and magnitude are infinitely continuous quantities. However, there is nothing inherently contradictory in “the highest degree of knowledge” or “the highest degree of power,” so omniscience and omnipotence are rightly considered divine perfections (DM 1). We can say a being possesses limitless knowledge and power without predicating meaningless, impossible attributes of God. Importantly for the purposes of an ontological proof, existence qualifies as perfection under Leibniz’s definition.

Leibniz argues for the compatibility of all perfections by further stipulating that by “perfection” he means a simple, positive quality (L 167). Once we recognize that perfections are simple qualities, Leibniz believes we easily arrive at the conclusion that there is nothing inherently contradictory in the idea of a perfect being. For, were two perfections incompatible, this fact would be evident either immediately or through an analysis of the perfections in question. In the case of perfections like knowledge and power, no immediate incompatibility presents itself. Yet, because these qualities are simple, they cannot be broken down into components which might be shown incompatible. Since the incompatibility of perfections can be shown neither in itself, nor through demonstration, Leibniz concludes that God is a logically possible being. And—following the logic of the ontological proof—if possible, God is necessary.

Leibniz does not disallow other, a posteriori proofs for God’s existence. To the contrary, he employs several such proofs in his writings. Since it turns so much on the idea of perfection, however, his defense of the ontological proof holds a special place in his theodicy and thus in his philosophy as a whole.

c. Possible Worlds and Optimism

As an absolutely perfect being, God acts in the most perfect fashion. To understand what this means for an account of creation and a defense of God’s justice, Leibniz turns to the idea of possible worlds. A possible world is any set of possible substances whose attributes are mutually consistent, or compatible, with one another. Monads whose mutual existence would not entail contradictions are said to be compossible and thus potential members of a common world. God, in his omniscience, surveys an infinite number of compossible sets of substances and chooses to create the optimal, or best possible, world

What characterizes the best possible world? By what criteria does God make his selection? In the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz writes that God selects that world which most effectively balances simplicity of means with richness of effects (DM 5). He likens God to a skilled architect who best employs the space and resources available to him, or a skilled geometer who finds the most elegant solution to a problem. Simplicity of means requires that there be order, efficiency, continuity, and intelligibility in the world. Richness of effects requires the maximization of both metaphysical and moral goodness. Metaphysical goodness denotes the amount of essence or perfection in the world, in short, the extent to which various creatures in the world imitate God’s inexhaustible essence. Maximizing metaphysical goodness therefore requires, at the very least, the creation of a great variety of creatures. Moral goodness refers to the happiness of rational beings, particularly the perfection and advancement of their rational faculties.

Much scholarship is devoted to determining precisely how Leibniz sees richness and simplicity coinciding in the best possible world. The task of interpretation gains complexity from the fact that Leibniz also speaks of God optimizing beauty and harmony, and even at times suggests that the best possible world progresses continually in perfection over time. Despite the difficulties in interpretation, it is clear that at the very least rational beings must inhabit an intelligible world. The perfections of rational beings interfere with one another least and thus are maximally compossible. Rarely does the knowledge and virtue of one person prevent or disallow the knowledge and virtue of another. By contrast, the beauty of a mountain range does preclude the beauty of plains at a given space and time. Because rational beings are capable of knowing God and entering into relationship with him, they are most responsible for maximizing metaphysical and moral goodness in the world. The intelligible order of creation aids them in this by making knowledge of various phenomena accessible through simple hypotheses.

Crucially, the existence of suffering does not count as proof against our world as being the best possible. By Leibniz’s lights, the goodness of the world as a whole does not require that each aspect of the world be choice worthy in itself. Pain and suffering find their place in the best possible world as “necessary evils” in maximizing its overall goodness. Here, the question of God’s justice arises and the true importance of possible worlds for Leibniz’s theodicy comes to light. How can God will to create pain and suffering? Does creating these not compromise divine justice? Leibniz responds that the divine will desires only what is good. The divine intellect takes, as it were, this desire for the good and determines how best to actualize it. The construction of the best possible world is the work of the divine intellect, and no more a matter of God’s will than the solution to an algebra equation depends on my will. God, Leibniz asserts, antecedently wills the good and consequently wills the best. God never wills evils in themselves, and never compromises his perfection, goodness, or justice. He accepts evil and suffering only insofar as they contribute to the overall goodness of the best possible world.

The distinction between what follows from the divine will and what follows from the divine intellect ultimately provides Leibniz with a means of upholding God’s perfection, despite the imperfections of creation. Were the conditions of the optimal world determined not by the divine intellect, but rather by arbitrary fiat, God would be no more than a despot and we would have no objective standard by which to judge his actions best. Were pain and suffering objects of the divine will per se, God would be cruel and unworthy of love. In other words, Leibniz believes he safeguards divine perfection by explaining that God is neither injudicious in thought nor vicious in will in creating the world as it is. Thus, assuring ourselves of God’s goodness and perfection is vital because “one cannot love God without knowing his perfections” (T 54) and loving God provides more happiness and peace of mind than any other activity. “To love is to find pleasure in the happiness of another. We love God himself above all things because the pleasure which we experience in contemplating the most beautiful being of all is greater than any conceivable joy” (L 134).

Leibniz insists that his optimism provides grounds for true joy and peace of mind, not simply the kind of disaffected, “grin and bear it” acquiescence commonly associated with the Stoics and—as Leibniz sees it—championed by Spinoza and Descartes. God does not what he must, but what is best. Whether or not Leibniz offers any greater consolation than the Stoics is an open question. Yet Leibniz believes that even if one cannot see the purpose of suffering, one can gain some measure of joy by contemplating, and advancing in knowledge of, God’s perfection.

Furthermore, because the theory of pre-established harmony among substances requires that all monads be created or destroyed collectively, Leibniz defends the immortality of monads. What we consider “life” is an active state of perception and appetite; what we consider “death” is simply dormancy. Leibniz, not unlike other Christian thinkers before him, maintains the hope that God will compensate for evils suffered by individuals over the full course of their existence, even if the purpose of those evils is not evident during their natural lifespans.

d. Freedom and Necessity

Leibniz’s theodicy raises two weighty sets of questions regarding freedom. The first concerns God’s freedom in creating. If the divine intellect objectively determines the design of the best possible world, should we not conclude that God is determined to create just this world? Is the notion of the divine will not meaningless, compromising the theological concept of grace? The second set of questions concerns human freedom. Since each individual substance contains all that can ever be predicated of it, and since God surveys the activity and interrelations of all monads in selecting the best possible world, it would seem that the entire course of history is set before the creation of the world. Does this mean that the idea of free will—and along with it theological concepts such as sin and redemption—is meaningless?

Leibniz takes these questions seriously throughout his career. His reflections trace at least to his Confession of a Philosopher of 1672-3. Section 13 of 1686’s Discourse on Metaphysics, which explores freedom and necessity, spurs his lengthy correspondence with Antoine Arnauld. And in the Theodicy of 1710, Leibniz calls the “labyrinth of freedom and necessity” one of the most perplexing questions facing humankind.

Though far from the first thinker to confront this “labyrinth,” Leibniz’s original contribution lies in his distinction between two kinds of necessity. Truths whose contraries imply a contradiction Leibniz calls “necessary per se.” Among these truths governed by the principle of non-contradiction, Leibniz includes the laws of arithmetic, geometry, and logic. Because these truths cannot be otherwise, not even to the divine intellect, Leibniz posits that they hold in all possible worlds. He thus refers to propositions necessary per se as “eternal verities.”

Truths which are certain, but whose contrary does not imply contradiction, Leibniz terms “necessary ex hypothesi.” The sequence of events in the world is necessary in this way. It is logically possible to conceive of the world being otherwise than it is. We create fictionalized accounts of reality in novels and dramas all the time; these accounts are entirely consistent in themselves. Because events in the world can be imagined otherwise, Leibniz believes they are in themselves contingent (contingent per se). Nevertheless, events in the world necessarily happen as they do on the presumption of (ex hypothesi) God’s selection of the best possible world. While the created world could be otherwise than it is, the optimal world could not be. Truths necessary ex hypothesi are governed by the principle of sufficient reason: God has a reason, a cause for creating the world in this way, namely, his desire for the best.

Leibniz locates a second method of distinguishing truths necessary per se from truths contingent per se in their respective manners of demonstration. The truth of a claim necessary per se, Leibniz writes, can be demonstrated a priori in a finite analysis, a proof with a finite number of steps. Think of Euclid’s demonstrations of the principles of geometry. Proving the truth of a contingent proposition, by contrast, requires an infinite analysis. To explain a priori why a given proposition about the world is true, one would have to take into account its harmony with all the other substances in the world, as well as account for why this set of substances was chosen out of the infinite number of possible worlds. Explanation would literally proceed ad infinitum. This is not to say that contingent truths are unknowable. God’s infinite intellect can presumably handle an infinite analysis and we know contingent truths a posteriori through experience. Infinitude of an analysis is a formal property of certain demonstrations, one Leibniz thinks suffices to distinguish necessary ex hypothesi from necessary per se truths.

With the distinction between the two kinds of necessity, Leibniz attempts to maintain meaningful notions of both divine and human freedom. Since God has infinitely many options among possible worlds, he cannot be said to be required in creating. One might object that God’s benevolent nature constrains and determines his action by forcing God to select the best world his intellect can design. Leibniz, however, counters that acting in accord with one’s nature and for the sake of the best is true freedom. One is only determined when constrained by outside forces. That God’s own nature leads him to create the best from among possible worlds makes him all the more free and worthy of praise.

Whether Leibniz is licensed to speak of human freedom is a thornier issue. Kant, in his Critique of Practical Reason, famously scoffs that Leibniz grants human beings nothing more than “the freedom of a turnspit” which, “once it is wound up, also accomplishes its movements of itself” (I.3; 5:97). Kant reasons that Leibniz’s monads, like any good machine, simply execute what they are programmed to do. To an extent, Kant is right. Leibniz does not entertain a notion of “free will,” if by this one means arbitrary and completely undetermined choice. The principle of sufficient reason banishes arbitrary choice. Human beings act in accord with their own natures, choosing what they deem best. My individual essence provides the reason for what I do

Yet while rejecting a voluntarist conception of free will, Leibniz nevertheless speaks of human freedom. We might reconstruct Leibniz’s reasoning in three steps. First, with the modal distinction between the two kinds of necessity, Leibniz insists that human choices are not necessary in the strong sense. Each truth about monads and their history is logically contingent. Leibniz, therefore, is not a logical determinist. He is however, an ontological determinist, insofar as all events are necessary given the composition of the world. Nevertheless—and this is the second step—the fact that each substance is causally independent of all other created substances makes each monad spontaneous. Spontaneity, to reiterate, refers to the fact that each state of a created substance follows from its preceding state without the direct influence of other substances; in this sense, each substance is “free.” Still, spontaneity is not what most people mean by human freedom. Human freedom—step three—comes with the fact that rational beings can gain knowledge of the causal principles governing the sequence of events in the world. Acting with knowledge does not make one less determined, but does make one less passive. One feels less at the mercy of inalterable forces when one understands these forces and can appreciate the principles of God’s design. The idea that increased activity and knowledge make an individual free owes much more to the conception of freedom developed by the Stoics and revived in the 17th century by Spinoza than it owes to voluntarist and Protestant conceptions of free will. As Leibniz sees it, his is the only conception of freedom compatible with divine perfection and worldly optimism.

5. Epistemology

a. Ideas and Knowledge

Leibniz’s epistemology begins with the distinction between clear and obscure ideas. An idea is clear when it allows one to recognize the thing represented, obscure when it does not. For example, one may have seen a gerbil and thus have an idea of what a gerbil is. However, if the next time she encounters a small rodent she cannot tell whether it is a gerbil or a hamster, then she possesses only an obscure idea of “gerbil.” By contrast, when one’s idea suffices to reliably distinguish one kind of object from others, then the idea is clear.

Leibniz divides clear ideas into two classes: confused and distinct. A clear idea is also distinct when one can catalogue all the marks, or criteria, distinguishing that idea from others. The animal physiologist can differentiate and enumerate those characteristics common to all rodents and those unique to gerbils. A child with a pet gerbil might not be able to do so and thus would have a clear but confused idea. Leibniz believes our sensory ideas, such as those of color, are clear and confused. Though we reliably distinguish blue from red, we cannot necessarily spell out the marks or causes which make one object blue and another red. We perceive colors without explaining them.

Leibniz proceeds to further classify clear and distinct ideas as either adequate or inadequate. If possessing an adequate idea, one has clear and distinct knowledge not only of the idea in question, but also of all its component parts. One has clear and distinct knowledge “all the way down” to the primitive concepts which compose the idea. Leibniz admits that he is unsure if any human being possesses an adequate idea, but believes our arithmetical knowledge most nearly approaches adequacy. In all other cases, where one cannot carry out comprehensive analyses down to primitive concepts, one has clear, distinct, yet inadequate ideas.

At its highest reaches, knowledge is not only adequate, but also intuitive. Intuitive knowledge is both adequate and non-discursive. That is, one clearly and distinctly knows all the ingredients of an idea and grasps these simultaneously. As is the case with all adequate knowledge, intuitive knowledge seems more suited to divine knowers than to human knowers, as the latter cannot think about all the components of a complex concept at once.

One consequence of Leibniz’s taxonomy of knowledge is that it provides Leibniz with a means of explaining sense perception. Given Leibniz’s idealism, all that exists in the world are monads and their mental states. Bodies are phenomenal and therefore not sources of knowledge. What, then, is sense perception? Is there any real difference between sensation and intellection if all ideas follow spontaneously from a monad’s own concept, with no interaction between monads? Leibniz answers such questions by noting that what we commonly experience as sense perceptions are simply confused ideas. Even if they are clear, sense perceptions are necessarily confused. Though these perceptions arise spontaneously in the perceiving subject, they express the harmony between a given monad and all others; it is therefore impossible to enumerate all the contributing factors to any given sense perception, most of which fall below the threshold of consciousness (DM 33). With the category of clear and confused ideas, Leibniz can meaningfully retain the distinction between sensation and intellection without compromising the basic tenets of his idealism.

Leibniz’s approach to ideas and knowledge separates him in some key respects from his fellow 17th century rationalists. The division between distinctness and adequacy leads Leibniz to differentiate between nominal and real definitions. Nominal definitions include distinct knowledge; they sufficiently identify the defining marks of a concept. Yet they do not ensure that the concept is possible. It could be that a concept is internally inconsistent, a fact which would be revealed if one had adequate knowledge of all its parts. Real definitions account for the possibility of a thing, either by citing experience or through a priori demonstration. In his discussion of definition, Leibniz seeks to modify Hobbes’ strong nominalism in which all truth is dependent on the relationship between names and definitions. There is a higher level of knowledge than that contained in nominal definitions, one which accounts for possible existence in reality.

Hobbes is not Leibniz’s only rationalist target. Leibniz believes he improves upon Descartes’ maxim that all clearly and distinctly perceived ideas are true by delineating better criteria for clarity and distinctness. To Leibniz, Descartes construes clarity and distinctness as something like immediately perceived qualities, ripe for misevaluation.

b. Innate Ideas

In the New Essays on Human Understanding, Leibniz takes aim at Locke’s depiction of the mind as a tabula rasa, or blank tablet, needing external impressions to furnish it with the contents of its reasoning. In opposition to this conception of the mind and cognition, Leibniz affirms the existence of innate ideas. In one sense, Leibniz’s theory of substance obviously commits him to some conception of innate ideas. If monads have no “windows” through which they interact with other substances, then of course all their ideas must have an internal, innate origin.

But Leibniz does not rest his defense of innate ideas on his theory of substance. Rather, he advances fairly traditional epistemological arguments regarding the nature of deductive, a priori truths. Empirical knowledge can show that something is the case but cannot show that something is necessarily the case. The human mind, however, has knowledge of necessary truths, such as the laws of arithmetic and geometry. These necessary truths, which Leibniz calls “truths of reason,” are ideas whose opposite is impossible. They are the eternal truths which obtain in all possible worlds. Because truths of reason are known solely through the principle of non-contradiction and require no empirical data, Leibniz concludes that they are innate to the mind. Leibniz contrasts innate ideas with “truths of fact,” contingent truths whose opposite is possible and knowledge of which requires experience.

The theory of innate ideas does not imply that all minds have equal awareness of the truths of reason. Ideas are innate in us not as actualities, but “as inclinations, dispositions, tendencies, or natural potentialities” (NE 52). Accessing truths of reason requires effort. Yet the presence of innate ideas does incline us towards their discovery. In one particularly apt metaphor, Leibniz claims that rational minds are not like blank tablets, but like veined pieces of marble, disposed to be cut and polished in determinate ways.

c. Petites Perceptions

One of the more original elements of Leibniz’s epistemology is his theory of petites perceptions.

There are hundreds of indications leading us to conclude that at every moment there is in us an infinity of perceptions, unaccompanied by awareness or reflection; that is, of alterations in the soul itself, of which we are unaware because these impressions are either too minute and too numerous, or else too unvarying, so that they are not sufficiently distinctive on their own. But when they are combined with others they do nevertheless have their effect and make themselves felt, at least confusedly, within the whole. (NE 53)

Leibniz posits that at any given time, the mind has not only the thoughts of which it is aware, but also innumerable small, insensible perceptions, which he calls petites perceptions.

Leibniz wagers that there are “hundreds of indications” pointing to existence of petites perceptions. Regardless of whether this is hyperbole, there are at least a few good reasons Leibniz includes these perceptions in his theory. For one, petites perceptions follow from the theory of pre-established harmony, both the harmony between all substances and the harmony between mind and body. Each monad mirrors the activity of all others at all moments. This mirroring takes place via mutual representation. Since no mind, at any given moment, has conscious awareness of all other substances, mutual representation must be taking place at insensible levels via petites perceptions. Moreover, the pre-established harmony between mind and body requires that mental activity express and run parallel to bodily activity. However, one is often insensitive to one’s bodily processes. In order to maintain the perfect parallelism between body and mind, therefore, we must conclude that the mind has petites perceptions of the body’s activity.

Even more fundamentally, the existence of petites perceptions follows from Leibniz’s understanding of substance. It is of a piece with the thesis that “there is nothing in the world but simple substances and in them perception and appetite.” Activity, more specifically perception, is the mark of any substance. That the mind has petites perceptions explains how it remains active and substantial even in dreamless sleep or after death.

Petites perceptions also help to explain the workings of appetite. Appetite determines the transition from one perception to the next, a transition which oftentimes seems sudden and episodic. For instance, one might jump immediately from thinking of one’s mother to thinking of Beethoven’s fifth symphony. On its face, this transition violates the principle of continuity, which states that no discontinuous change occurs. Nature—including rational nature—makes no leaps, has no gaps. The theory of petites perceptions accounts for apparent leaps in perception. What appears a discontinuous change in thought is actually determined by the continuous workings and interactions of infinitely many insensible perceptions.

Finally, petites perceptions help to explain what is confused in a confused idea, particularly in sense perceptions. The difficulty in explaining all the marks of a sensation comes from the many petites perceptions which contribute to it. “These minute perceptions…constitute that je ne sais quoi, those flavors, those images of sensible qualities, vivid in the aggregate but confused as to the parts; those impressions which are made on us by the bodies around us and which involve the infinite; that connection each of us has with the rest of the universe” (NE 54-5).

d. Reflection, Memory, Selfhood

All substances are incorporeal and perceptive. For this reason, Leibniz understands all substances on analogy to human minds or souls. Leibniz reserves the proper use of the term “soul,” however, for higher order substances with particular cognitive capacities. Souls not only perceive, but also apperceive. That is, they not only perceive objects, but also think about and reflect on themselves. They have the added capacity to remember past perceptions. These abilities to reflect and remember provide souls with a sense of self, an understanding of the “I.” As a result, souls have moral identities. Moral identity goes beyond the substantial identity over time that all monads have; moral identity requires that one can remember his past actions, recognize himself as the selfsame individual over time, and therefore assume responsibility for his character.

Reflection and memory make souls not just moral beings, but intellectual beings as well. Leibniz observes that self-reflection serves as the starting point for all metaphysical and philosophical thinking. Each soul is, as it were, its own principal innate idea. Studying one’s own nature leads one to form and investigate fundamental metaphysical ideas. “In thinking of ourselves, we think of being, of substance, of the simple and the composite, of the immaterial, and of God himself, by conceiving that that which is limited in us is limitless in him. And these reflective acts furnish the principle objects of our reasonings” (M 30).

Because of their moral and intellectual capacities, Leibniz likens souls to “little divinities” (M 30). Leibniz expresses the near divinity of rationality rather poignantly in the Theodicy:

This portion of reason which we possess is a gift of God and consists in the natural light that has remained with us in the midst of corruption; thus it is in accordance with the whole, and it differs from that which is in God only as a drop of water differs from the ocean, or rather as the finite from the infinite. (T 169)

Though every substance reflects God and his plan for the cosmos, rational souls are mirrors of God in a heightened way, being able to understand the nature of things, reflect on God’s works, and ultimately enter into relationship with him (M 83-84).

6. Ethics

Of the traditional major content areas of philosophy, ethics is perhaps the only one to which Leibniz is generally not considered to have made significant contribution. Certainly he does not share the reputation as an ethicist enjoyed by early modern thinkers Spinoza, Hume, and Kant, nor does he share the influence in political philosophy had by Locke and Hobbes. Leibniz himself, however, took great interest in the ethical dimensions of his thought. He engaged in central debates of the day regarding the foundations of justice and the possibility of altruistic love. Furthermore, all his thinking has a clear ethical bent, with the peace of mind sought by his optimism a prime example of this. While Leibniz’s ethical contributions do not match his metaphysics in scope or originality, when it comes to a thinker as singular as Leibniz, this fact alone should not discourage inquiry into his ethics.

a. Intellect and Will

Leibniz’s approach to ethics is, broadly speaking, intellectualist in nature. That is, Leibniz sees moral goodness as increasing in line with knowledge. He defines will as “the inclination to do something in proportion to the good it contains” (T 139). Hence, the more knowledge one has of the goodness of a particular object or act, the better one’s will is directed. Loving and desiring the right kinds of things follows from proper understanding. Perfecting the intellect, in short, accomplishes the perfection of the will.

Perfecting the intellect also brings about happiness. “It is obvious,” Leibniz writes, “that the happiness of mankind consists in two things—to have the power, as far as permitted, to do what it wills and to know what, from the nature of things, ought to be willed. Of these, mankind has almost achieved the former; as to the latter, it has failed in that it is particularly impotent with respect to itself” (L130). Despite Leibniz’s dour diagnosis of humanity’s understanding of perfection, his prognosis is encouraging. He does not see happiness as particularly difficult to achieve. One need only pursue and acquire knowledge of the nature of things.

The close alliance Leibniz sees between intellect and will has the further consequence of ruling out indifference of equipoise, a topic of much debate in the 17th century At issue in discussions of this “indifference” is the question of whether one’s will can be in complete suspension when faced with two or more options, without inclination one way or another. The purported phenomenon of indifference of equipoise was taken at the time as evidence of the will’s independence from the intellect and even of its capacity for free, uncaused choice.

Leibniz rejects indifference of equipoise on grounds of the principle of sufficient reason. Uncaused events are incomprehensible; all events, including acts of the will, have some explanation. Here the deeper significance of Leibniz’s account of the will comes to light: one’s knowledge of the goodness of things provides the reason the will chooses as it does. Still, one might ask, could not the will be in equilibrium when faced with two objects of equal goodness? No. Per the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, each substance in the world has a unique complete concept which mirrors God and creation in a unique way; no two substances, no two states of affairs, are equivalent in goodness. One’s intellect and will therefore cannot respond identically to two different options. Though we may sometimes feel completely indifferent and unable to articulate the reasons for a choice, Leibniz insists that it would be a mistake to think of the choice as uncaused or of the will as uninclined. Infinitely many petites perceptions are at work in one’s mind at all times; much like machines, our movements are the result of all the tendencies and inclinations within us, even those of which we are unaware. Thus, we should not champion arbitrary choice by citing indifference of equipoise, but rather become freer, more self-aware moral beings through progress in knowledge.

b. Justice and Charity

Leibniz sees the study of justice as an a priori science of the good. There is, that is, an objective, rational basis for justice. Though Leibniz wrote much regarding the positive laws of states, he does not see positive law as the foundation of justice. He rejects the position that justice has no firmer foundation than the fiat of those in power, a position Leibniz often mentions in conjunction with Thrasymachus from Plato’s Republic but more pointedly associates with Samuel von Pufendorf and Thomas Hobbes. Taken to its logical conclusion, this position results in divine command theory: certain principles are just simply because God, the most powerful of all legislators, has posited they be so. For Leibniz, this line of thinking violates God’s perfection. God acts in the most perfect way and thus acts with good reason, not by arbitrary fiat. He is perfect not only in power, but also in wisdom. God’s perfect will follows upon his perfect intellect no less than the will of any rational being follows upon her intellect. The a priori, eternal standard of justice to which God himself adheres provides the basis for a theory of natural law.

Leibniz defines justice as the charity of the wise person. Though this may seem unique, or even odd, to those accustomed to seeing justice and charity contrasted, what is truly original in Leibniz’s rooting justice in charity is his very definition of charity, or love. In the 17th C., there were a series of debates regarding the possibility of disinterested love. Each creature, it would seem, acts to preserve and advance its own being. Hobbes and Spinoza employed the term conatus to refer to the striving each being has to persist in its own being and made it the foundation of their respective psychologies. On this view, one loves what one finds pleasing, that is, what one finds conducive to his own persistence. Love is reduced to a kind of egoism which, even where benevolent, nevertheless lacks an altruistic component.

Leibniz attempts to obviate the tension between egoism and altruism by defining love as taking pleasure in the happiness, or perfection, of another. With this definition, Leibniz does not deny the fundamental drive all creatures have for pleasure and self-interest, but ties it to altruistic concern for the well-being of others. The coincidence of altruism and self-interest defines love and captures the essence of justice. Justice is the charity of the wise person and the wise person, Leibniz goes on to say, loves all. Leibniz’s basic contention is that to be just is to show the love attended by insight that God shows. Ethics involves seeking the good of all in a prudent way, such that the good of each individual is pursued only insofar as it is compatible with the whole. One cannot love all when obtaining the happiness of one person at the expense of another’s, nor would this be desirable, since Leibniz believes we find more pleasure in harmony than discord. The kind of universal love demanded by Leibniz’s definition of justice is nurtured by reflection on the universal harmony between all things. Leibniz believes that appreciating the harmonious order of the cosmos can lead individuals to find pleasure in increasing the perfection and happiness of all who share in that order.

Leibniz’s definition of love also entails that loving God is the highest end of rational beings. If love is finding pleasure in the perfection of another, then loving an infinitely perfect being affords the greatest possible pleasure and happiness.

To love is to find pleasure in the happiness of another. We love God himself above all things because the pleasure which we experience in contemplating the most beautiful being of all is greater than any conceivable joy. (L 134)

Since the harmony of the world mirrors God’s perfection, Leibniz’s conception of justice does not place love of God at odds with love of others. We should take pleasure in perfection wherever we discern it. Justice as the charity of the wise person means that love of God and love of neighbor are one. By identifying justice with love of God and harmony between all, Leibniz brings to fruition the ethical implications of his metaphysical inquiries into God’s perfection and pre-established harmony. Ethics and metaphysics are, for Leibniz, never far apart.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources: Leibniz Texts and Translations

The standard critical edition of Leibniz’s writings is G.W. Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, edited by the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften (Berlin: Academy Verlag, 1923- ). The Akademie edition is still in production. Other useful editions of Leibniz’s writings in their original languages are those of C. I. Gerhardt (Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz. 7 vols. 1875-1890) and Ludovici Dutens (Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Opera Omnia. Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag, 1989).

References in this article to Leibniz’s works use the following abbreviations and translations:

AG     G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.

DM      Discourse on Metaphysics, as translated by Ariew and Garber in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Passages from the Discourse are cited by section number.

G         Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin. 7 vols. 1875-1890.

L        G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited and translated by Leroy E. Loemker. 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989.

LA      The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence. Edited by H.T. Mason. Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1967.

M        Monadology, as translated by Ariew and Garber in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Passages from the Monadology are cited by section number.

NE       New Essays on Human Understanding. Edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathan Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

T          Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man, and the Problem of Evil. Translated by E.M. Huggard. BiblioBazaar, 2007.

Other helpful collections of Leibniz’s writings in English include:

  • The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence. Edited by H.G. Alexander. New York: Philosophical Library, 1956.
  • The Labyrinth of the Continuum: Writings on the Continuum Problem, 1672-1686. Edited by Richard W. T. Arthur. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2002.
  • The Leibniz-Des Bosses Correspondence. Edited by Brandon C. Look and Donald Rutherford. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2007.
  • Leibniz: Logical Papers. Edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1966.
  • De Summa Rerum: Metaphysical Papers, 1675-1676. Edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1992.
  • Leibniz: Political Writings. Edited by Patrick Riley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Confessio Philosophi: Papers Concerning the Problem of Evil, 1671-1678. Edited by Robert C. Sleigh, Jr. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2005.
  • Leibniz and the Two Sophies: The Philosophical Correspondence. Edited by Lloyd Strickland. Toronto: Iter, Inc., 2011.
  • Leibniz’s ‘New System’ and Associated Contemporary Texts. Edited by R.S. Woolhouse and Richard Francks. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997.

b. Secondary Sources

i. Introductory Texts

  • Antognazza, Maria Rosa. Leibniz: An Intellectual Biography. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
  • Arthur, Richard T.W. Leibniz. Cambridge: Polity Press, 2014.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. Leibniz. New York: Routledge, 2005.
  • Perkins, Franklin. Leibniz: A Guide for the Perplexed. New York: Continuum, 2007.
  • Savile, Anthony. Routledge Guidebook to Leibniz and the Monadology.New York: Routledge, 2000.

ii. More Advanced Studies

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press,  1994.
  • Garber, Daniel. Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Ishiguro, Hidé. Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1975.
  • Mercer, Christia. Leibniz’s Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Parkinson, G.H.R. Logic and Reality in Leibniz’s Metaphysics. Cambridge: Oxford University Press, 1965.
  • Rescher. Nicholas. Leibniz’s Metaphysics of Nature. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1981.
  • Riley, Patrick. Leibniz’s Universal Jurisprudence: Justice as the Charity of the Wise. Harvard University Press, 1996.
  • Rutherford, Donald. Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Sleigh, Robert C. Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on their Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
  • Smith, Justin E.H. Divine Machines: Leibniz and the Sciences of Life. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2011.
  • Strickland, Lloyd. Leibniz Reinterpreted. London: Continuum, 2006.
  • Wilson, Catherine. Leibniz’s Metaphysics: A Historical and Comparative Study. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989.

iii. Collected Essays 

  • Brown, Stuart, ed. The Young Leibniz and his Philosophy (1646-76). Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1999.
  • Jorgensen and Newlands, eds. New Essays on Leibniz’s Theodicy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
  • Jolley, Nicholas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz. edited by Nicholas Jolley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Rutherford and Cover, eds. Leibniz: Nature and Freedom. New York: Oxford University Press, 2005.


Author Information

Edward W. Glowienka
Carroll College
U. S. A.

Locke: Ethics

LockeThe major writings of John Locke (1632–1704) are among the most important texts for understanding some of the central currents in epistemology, metaphysics, politics, religion, and pedagogy in the late 17th and early 18th century in Western Europe. His magnum opus, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689) is the undeniable starting point for the study of empiricism in the early modern period. Locke’s best-known political text, Two Treatises of Government (1693) criticizes the political system according to which kings rule by divine right (First Treatise) and lays the foundation for modern liberalism (Second Treatise). His Letter Concerning Toleration (1689) argues that much civil unrest is borne of the state trying to prevent the practice of different religions. In this text, Locke suggests that the proper domain of government does not include deciding which religious path the people ought to take for salvation—in short, it is an argument for the separation of church and state. Some Thoughts Concerning Education (1693) is a very influential text in early modern Europe that outlines the best way to rear children. It suggests that the virtue of a person is directly related to the habits of body and the habits of mind instilled in them by their educators.

Although these texts enjoy a status of “must-reads,” Locke’s views on ethics or moral philosophy have nowhere near the same high status. The reason for this is, in large part, that Locke never wrote a text devoted to the topic. This omission is surprising given that several of his friends entreated him to set down his thoughts about ethics. They saw that the scattered remarks that Locke makes about morality here and there throughout his works were, at times, quite provocative and in need of further development and defense. But, for reasons unknown to us, Locke never indulged his friends with a more systematic moral philosophy. It is thus up to his readers to stitch together his fragmented remarks about happiness, moral laws, freedom, and virtue in order to see what kind of moral philosophy is woven through the texts and to determine whether it is a coherent position.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Good
    1. Pleasure and Pain
    2. Happiness
  3. The Law of Nature
    1. Existence
    2. Content
    3. Authority
    4. Reconciling the Law with Happiness
  4. Power, Freedom, and Suspending Desire
    1. Passive and Active Powers
    2. The Will
    3. Freedom
    4. Judgment
  5. Living the Moral Life
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources: Books
    3. Secondary Sources: Articles

1. Introduction

While Locke did not write a treatise devoted to a discussion of ethics, there are strands of discussion of morality that weave through many, if not most, of his works. One such strand is evident near the end of his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (hereafter: Essay) where he states that one of the most important aspects of improving our knowledge is to recognize the kinds of things that we can truly know. With this recognition, he says, we are able to finely-tune the focus of our enquiries for optimal results. And, he concludes, given the natural capacities of human beings, “Morality is the proper Science, and Business of Mankind in general” because human beings are both “concerned” and “fitted to search out their Summum Bonum [highest good]” (Essay, Book IV, chapter xii, section 11; hereafter: Essay, IV.xii.11). This claim indicates that Locke takes the investigation of morality to be of utmost importance and gives us good reason to think that Locke’s analysis of the workings of human understanding in general is intimately connected to discovering how the science proper to humankind is to be practiced. The content of the knowledge of ethics includes information about what we, as rational and voluntary agents, ought to do in order to obtain an end, in particular, the end of happiness. It is the science, Locke says, of using the powers that we have as human beings in order to act in such a way that we obtain things that are good and useful for us. As he says: ethics is “the seeking out those Rules, and Measures of humane Actions, which lead to Happiness, and the Means to practice them” (Essay, IV.xxi.3). So, there are several elements in the landscape of Locke’s ethics: happiness or the highest good as the end of human action; the rules that govern human action; the powers that command human action; and the ways and means by which the rules are practiced. While Locke lays out this conception of ethics in the Essay, not all aspects of his definition are explored in detail in that text. So, in order to get the full picture of how he understands each element of his description of ethics, we must often look to several different texts where they receive a fuller treatment. This means that Locke himself does not explain how these elements fit together leaving his overarching theory somewhat of a puzzle for future commentators to contemplate. But, by mining different texts in this way, we can piece together the details of an ethical theory that, while not always obviously coherent, presents a depth and complexity that, at minimum, confirms that this is a puzzle worth trying to solve.

2. The Good

a. Pleasure and Pain

The thread of moral discussion that weaves most consistently throughout the Essay is the subject of happiness. True happiness, on Locke’s account, is associated with the good, which in turn is associated with pleasure. Pleasure, in its turn, is taken by Locke to be the sole motive for human action. This means that the moral theory that is most directly endorsed in the Essay is hedonism.

On Locke’s view, ideas come to us by two means: sensation and reflection. This view is the cornerstone of his empiricism. According to this theory, there is no such thing as innate ideas or ideas that are inborn in the human mind. All ideas come to us by experience. Locke describes sensation as the “great source” of all our ideas and as wholly dependent on the contact between our sensory organs and the external world. The other source of ideas, reflection or “internal sense,” is dependent on the mind’s reflecting on its own operations, in particular the “satisfaction or uneasiness arising from any thought” (Essay, II.i.4). What’s more, Locke states that pleasure and pain are joined to almost all of our ideas both of sensation and of reflection (Essay, II.vii.2). This means that our mental content is organized, at least in one way, by ideas that are associated with pleasure and ideas that are associated with pain. That our ideas are associated with pains and pleasures seems compatible with our phenomenal experience: the contact between the sense organ of touch and a hot stove will result in an idea of the hot stove annexed by the idea of pain, or the act of remembering a romantic first kiss brings with it the idea of pleasure. And, Locke adds, it makes sense to join our ideas to the ideas of pleasure and pain because if our ideas were not joined with either pleasure of pain, we would have no reason to prefer the doing of one action over another, or the consideration of one idea over another. If this were our situation, we would have no reason to act—either physically or mentally (Essay, II.viii.3). That pleasure and pain are given this motivational role in action entails that Locke endorses hedonism: the pursuit of pleasure and the avoidance of pain are the sole motives for action.

Locke notes that among all the ideas that we receive by sensation and reflection, pleasure and pain are very important. And, he notes that the things that we describe as evil are no more than the things that are annexed to the idea of pain, and the things that we describe as good are no more than the things that are annexed to the idea of pleasure. In other words, the presence of good or evil is nothing other than the way a particular idea relates to us—either pleasurably or painfully. This means that on Locke’s view, good is just the category of things that tend to cause or increase pleasure or decrease pain in us, and evil is just the category of things that tend to cause or increase pain or decrease pleasure in us (Essay, II.xx.2). Now, we might think that, morally speaking, this way of defining good and evil gets Locke into trouble. Consider the following scenario. Smith enjoys breaking her promises. In other words, failing to honor her word brings her pleasure. According to the view just described, it seems that breaking promises, at least for Smith, is a good. For, if good and evil are defined as nothing more than pleasure and pain, it seems that if something gives Smith pleasure, it is impossible to deny that it is a good. This would be an unwelcome effect of Locke’s view, for it would indicate that his system leads directly to a kind of moral relativism. If promise breaking is pleasurable for Smith and promise keeping is pleasurable for her friend Jones and pleasure is the sign of the good, then it seems that the good is relative and there is no sense in which we can say that Jones is right about what is good and Smith is wrong. Locke blocks this kind of consequence for his view by introducing a distinction between “happiness” and “true happiness.” This indicates that while all things that bring us pleasure are linked to happiness, there is also a category of pleasure-bringing things that are linked to true happiness. It is the pursuit of the members of this special category of pleasurable things that is, for Locke, emblematic of the correct use of our intellectual powers.

b. Happiness

Locke is very clear—we all constantly desire happiness. All of our actions, on his view, are oriented towards securing happiness. Uneasiness, Locke’s technical term for being in a state of pain and desirous of some absent good, is the motive that moves us to act in the way that is expected to relieve the pain of desire and secure the state of happiness (Essay, II.xxi.36). But, while Locke equates pleasure with good, he is careful to distinguish the happiness that is acquired as a result of the satisfaction of any particular desire and the true happiness that is the result of the satisfaction of a particular kind of desire. Drawing this distinction allows Locke to hold that the pursuit of a certain sets of pleasures or goods is more worthy than the pursuit of others.

The pursuit of true happiness, according to Locke, is equated with “the highest perfection of intellectual nature” (Essay, II.xxi.51). And, indeed, Locke takes our pursuit of this true happiness to be the thing to which the vast majority of our efforts should be oriented. To do this, he says that we need to try to match our desires to “the true instrinsick good” that is really within things. Notice here that Locke is implying that there is distinction to be drawn between the “true intrinsic good” of a thing and, it seems, the good that we unreflectively take to be within a certain thing. The idea here is that attentively considering a particular thing will allow us to see its true value as opposed to the superficial value we assign to a thing based on our immediate reaction to it. We can think, for example, of a bitter tasting medicine. A face-value assessment of the medicine will lead us to evaluate that the thing is to be avoided. However, more information and contemplation of it will lead us to see that the true worth of the medicine is, in fact, high and so it should be evaluated as a good to be pursued. And, Locke states, if we contemplate a thing long enough, and see clearly the measure of its true worth; we can change our desire and uneasiness for it in proportion to that worth (Essay, II.xxi.53). But how are we to understand Locke’s suggestion that there is a true, intrinsic good in things? So far, all he has said about the good is that it is tracked by pleasure. We begin to get an answer to this question when Locke acknowledges the obvious fact that different people derive pleasure and pain from different things. While he reiterates that happiness is no more than the possession of those things that give the most pleasure and the absence of those things that cause the most pain, and that the objects in these two categories can vary widely among people, he adds the following provocative statement:

 If therefore Men in this Life only have hope; if in this Life they can only enjoy, 'tis not strange, nor unreasonable, that they should seek their Happiness by avoiding all things, that disease them here, and by pursuing all that delight them; wherein it will be no wonder to find variety and difference. For if there be no Prospect beyond the Grave, the inference is certainly right, Let us eat and drink, let us enjoy what we delight in, for tomorrow we shall die [Isa, 22:13; I Cor. 15:32]. (Essay, II.xxi.55)

Here, Locke suggests that pursuing and avoiding the particular things that give us pleasure or pain would be a perfectly acceptable way to live were there “no prospect beyond the grave.” It seems that what Locke means is that if there were no judgment day, which is to say that if our actions were not ultimately judged by God, there would be no reason to do otherwise than to blindly follow our pleasures and flee our pains. Now, given this suggestion, the question, then, is how to distinguish between the things that are pleasurable but that will not help our case on judgment day, and those that will. Locke provides a clue for how to do such a thing when he says that the will is typically determined by those things that are judged to be good by the understanding. However, in many cases we use “wrong measures of good and evil” and end by judging unworthy things to be good. He who makes such a mistake errs because “[t]he eternal Law and Nature of things must not be alter’d to comply with his ill order’d choice” (Essay, II.xxi.56). In other words, there is an ordered way to choose which things to pursue—the things that are in accordance with the eternal law and nature of things—and an ill-ordered way, in accordance with our own palates. This indicates that Locke takes there to be a fixed law that determines which things are worthy of our pursuit, and which are not. This means that Locke takes there to be an important distinction between the good, understood as all objects that are connected to pleasure and the moral good, understood as objects connected to pleasure which are also in conformity with a law. Though the distinctions between good and moral good, and between evil and moral evil are not discussed in any great detail by Locke, he does states that moral good and evil is nothing other than the “Conformity or Disagreement of our voluntary Actions to some Law.” Locke states punishments and rewards are bestowed on us for our following or failure to follow this law by “the Will and Power of the Law-maker” (Essay, II.xxviii.5). So, Locke affirms that moral good and evil are closely tied to the observance or violation of some law, and that the lawmaker has the power to reward or punish those who adhere to or stray from the law.

3. The Law of Nature

a. Existence

In the Essay, the concepts of laws and lawmakers do not receive much treatment beyond Locke’s affirmation that God has decreed laws and that there are rewards and punishments associated with the respect or violation of these laws (Essay, I.iii.6; I.iii.12; II.xxi.70; II.xxviii.6). The two most important questions concerning the role of laws in a system of ethics remain unanswered in the Essay: (1) how do we determine the content of the law? This is the epistemological question. And (2) what kind of authority does the law have to obligate? This is the moral question. Locke spends much time considering these questions in a series of nine essays written some thirty years before the Essay, which are known under the collected title Essays on the Law of Nature (hereafter: Law).

The first essay in the series treats the question of whether there is a “rule of morals, or law of nature given to us.” The answer is unequivocally “yes” (Law, Essay I, page 109; hereafter: Law, I: 109). The reason for this positive answer, in short, is because God exists. Locke appeals to a kind of teleological argument to support the claim of God’s existence, saying that given the organization of the universe, including the organized way in which animal and vegetable bodies propagate, there must be a governing principle that is responsible for the patterns we see on earth. And, if we extend this principle to the existence of human life, Locke claims that it is reasonable to believe that there is a pattern or a law that governs behavior. This law is to be understood as moral good or virtue and, Locke states, it is the decree of God’s will and is discernable by “the light of nature.” Because the law tells us what is and is not in conformity with “rational nature,” it has the status of commanding or prohibiting certain behaviors (Law, I: 111; see also Essay, IV.xix.16). Because all human beings possess, by nature, the faculty of reason, all human beings, at least in principle, can discover the natural law.

Locke offers five reasons for thinking that such a natural law exists. He begins by noting that it is evident that there is some disagreement among people about the content of the law. However, far from thinking that such disagreement casts doubt on the existence of the law, he takes the presence of disagreement about the law as evidence that such a true and objective law exists. Disagreements about the content of the law confirm that everyone is in agreement about the fundamental character of the law—that there are things that are by their nature good or evil—but just disagree about how to interpret the law (Law, I: 115). The existence of the law is further reinforced by the fact that we often pass judgment on our own actions, by way of our conscience, leading to feelings of guilt or pride. Because it is not possible, according to Locke, to pronounce a judgment without the existence of a law, the act of conscience demonstrates that such a natural law exists. Third, again appealing to a kind of teleological argument, Locke states that we see that laws govern all manner of natural operations and that it makes sense that human beings would also be governed by laws that are in accordance with their nature (Law, I: 117). Fourth, Locke states that without the natural law, society would not be able to run the way that it does. He suggests that the force of civil law is grounded on the natural law. In other words, without the natural law, positive law would have no moral authority. Elsewhere, Locke underlines this point by saying that given that the law of nature is the eternal rule for all men, the rules made by legislators must conform to this law (The Two Treatises of Government, Treatise II, section 135, hereafter: Government, II.35). Finally, on Locke’s view, there would be no virtue or vice, no reward or punishment, no guilt, if there were no natural law (Law, I: 119). Without the natural law, there would be no bounds on human action. This means that we would be motivated only to do what seems pleasurable and there would be no sense in which anyone could be considered virtuous or vicious. The existence of the natural law, then, allows us to be sensitive to the fact that there are certain pleasures that are more in line with what is objectively right. Indeed, Locke also gestures towards, but does not elaborate on, this kind of thought in the Essay. He suggests that the studious man, who takes all his pleasures from reading and learning will eventually be unable to ignore his desires for food and drink. Likewise, the “Epicure,” whose only interest is in the sensory pleasures of food and drink, will eventually turn his attention to study when shame or the desire to “recommend himself to his Mistress” will raise his uneasiness for knowledge (Essay, II.xxi.43).

So, Locke has given us five reasons to accept the existence of the law of nature that grounds virtuous and vicious behavior. We turn now to how he thinks we come to know the content of the law.

b. Content

Locke suggests that there are two ways to determine the content of the law of nature: by the light of nature and by sense experience.

Locke is careful to note that by “light of nature” he does not mean something like an “inward light” that is “implanted in man” and like a compass constantly leads human beings towards virtue. Rather, this light is to be understood as a kind of metaphor that indicates that truth can be attained by each of us individually by nothing more than the exercise of reason and the intellectual faculties (Law, II: 123). Locke uses a comparison to precious metal mining to make this point clear. He acknowledges that some might say that his explanation of the discovery of the content of the law by the light of nature entails that everyone should always be in possession of the knowledge of this content. But, he notes, this is to take the light of nature as something that is stamped on the hearts on human beings, which is a mistake (see Law, III, 137-145). While the depths of the earth might contain veins of gold and silver, Locke says, this does not mean that everyone living on the stretch of land above those veins is rich (Law, II: 135). Work must be done to dig out the precious metals in order to benefit from their value. Similarly, proper use must be made of the faculties we have in order to benefit from the certainty provided by the light of nature. Locke notes that we can come to know the law of nature, in a way, by tradition, which is to say by the testimony and instruction of other people. But it is a mistake to follow the law for any reason other than that we recognize its universal binding force. This can only be done by our own intellectual investigation (Law, II: 129).

But what, exactly, is the light of nature? Locke acknowledges that it is difficult to answer this question—it is not something stamped on the heart or mind, nor is it something that is exclusively learned by tradition or testimony. The only option left for describing it, then, is that it is something acquired or experienced by sense experience or by reason. And, indeed, Locke suggests that when these two faculties, reason and sensation, work together, nothing can remain obscure to the mind. Sensation provides the mind with ideas and reason guides the faculty of sensation and arranges “together the images of things derived from sense-perception, thence forming others [ideas] and composing new ones” (Law, IV: 147). Locke emphasizes that reason ought to be taken to mean “the discursive faculty of the mind, which advances from things known to thinks unknown,” using as its foundation the data provided by sense experience (Law, IV: 149).

When directly addressing the question of how the combination of reason and sense experience allow us to know the content of the law of nature, Locke states that two important truths must be acknowledged because they are “presupposed in the knowledge of any and every law” (Law, IV: 151). First, we must understand that there is a lawmaker who decreed the law, and that the lawmaker is rightly obeyed as a superior power (a discussion of this point is also found in Government, I.81). Second, we must understand that the lawmaker wishes those to whom the law is decreed to follow the law. Let us take each of these in turn.

Sense experience allows us to know that a lawmaker exists. To demonstrate this, Locke appeals, once again, to a kind of teleological argument: by our senses we come to know the objects external world and, importantly, the regularities with which they move and change. We also see that we human beings are part of the movements and changes of the external world. Reason, then, contemplates these regularities and orders of change and motion and naturally comes to inquire about their origin. The conclusion of such an inquiry, states Locke, is that a powerful and wise creator exists. This conclusion follows from two observations: (1) that beasts and inanimate things cannot be the cause of the existence of human beings because they are clearly less perfect than human beings, and something less perfect cannot bring more perfect things into existence, and 2) that we ourselves cannot be the cause of our own existence because if we possessed the power to create ourselves, we would also have the power to give ourselves eternal life. Because it is obviously the case that we do not have eternal life, Locke concludes that we cannot be the origin of our own existence. So, Locke says, there must be a powerful agent, God, who is the origin of our existence (Law, IV: 153). The senses provide the data from the external world, and reason contemplates the data and concludes that a creator of the observed objects and phenomena must exist. Once the existence of a creator is determined, Locke thinks that we can also see that the creator has “a just and inevitable command over us and at His pleasure can raise us up or throw us down, and make us by the same commanding power happy or miserable” (Law, IV: 155). This commanding power, on Locke’s view, indicates that we are necessarily subject to the decrees of God’s will. (A similar line of discussion is found in Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity, 144–46.)

As for the second truth, that the lawmaker, God, wishes us to follow the laws decreed, Locke states that once we see that there is a creator of all things and that an order obtains among them, we see that the creator is both powerful and wise. It follows from these evident attributes that God would not create something without a purpose. Moreover, we notice that our minds and bodies seem well equipped for action, which suggests, “God intends man to do something.” And, the “something” that we are made to do, according to Locke, is the same purpose shared by all created things—the glorification of God (Law, IV: 157). In the case of rational beings, Locke states that given our nature, our function is to use sense experience and reason in order to discover, contemplate, and praise God’s creation; to create a society with other people and to work to maintain and preserve both oneself and the community. And this, in fact, is the content of the law of nature—to preserve one’s own being and to work to maintain and preserve the beings of the other people in our community. This injunction to preserve oneself and to preserve one’s neighbors is also endorsed and stressed throughout Locke’s discussions of political power and freedom (see Government, I.86, 88, 120; II.6, 25, 128).

c. Authority

Once we have knowledge of the content of the law of nature, we must determine from where it derives its authority. In other words, we must ask why we are bound to follow the law once we are aware of its content. Locke begins this discussion by reiterating that the law of nature “is the care and preservation of oneself.” Given this law, he states that virtue should not be understood as a duty but rather the “convenience” of human beings. In this sense, the good is nothing more than what is useful. Further, he adds, the observance of this law is not so much an obligation but rather “a privilege and an advantage, to which we are led by expediency” (Law, VI: 181). This indicates that Locke thinks that actions that are in conformity with the law are useful and practical. In other words, it is in our best interest to follow the law. While this characterization of why we in fact follow the law is compelling, there is nevertheless still an inquiry to be made into why we ought to follow the law.

Locke begins his treatment of this question by stating that no one can oblige us to do anything unless the one who obliges has some superior right and power over us. The obligation that is generated between such a superior power and those who are subject to it results in two kinds of duties: (1) the duty to pay obedience to the command of the superior power. Because our faculties are suited to discover the existence of the divine lawmaker, Locke takes it to be impossible to avoid this discovery, barring some damage or impediment to our faculties. This duty is ultimately grounded in God’s will as the force by which we were created (Law, VI: 183). (2) The duty to suffer punishment as a result of the failure to honor the first duty—obedience. Now, it might seem odd that it would be necessary to postulate that punishment results from the failure to respect a law the content of which is only that we must take care of ourselves. In other words, how could anyone express so little interest in taking care of himself or herself that the fear of punishment is needed to motivate the actions necessary for such care? It is worth quoting Locke’s answer in full:

[A] liability to punishment, which arises from a failure to pay dutiful obedience, so that those who refuse to be led by reason and to own that in the matter of morals and right conduct they are subject to a superior authority may recognize that they are constrained by force and punishment to be submissive to that authority and feel the strength of Him whose will they refuse to follow. And so the force of this obligation seems to be grounded in the authority of a lawmaker, so that power compels those who cannot be moved by warnings. (Law, VI: 183)

So, even though the existence, content, and authority of the law of nature are known in virtue of the faculties possessed by all rational creatures—sense experience and reason—Locke recognizes that there are people who “refuse to be led by reason.” Because these people do not see the binding force of the law by their faculties alone, they need some other impetus to motivate their behavior. But, Locke thinks very ill of those who are in need of this other impetus. He says the these features of the law of nature can be discovered by anyone who is diligent about directing their mind to them, and can be concealed from no one “unless he loves blindness and darkness and casts off nature in order that he may avoid his duty” (Law, VI: 189, see also Government, II.6).

d. Reconciling the Law with Happiness

The main lines of Locke’s natural law theory are as follows: there is a moral law that is (1) discoverable by the combined work of reason and sense experience, and (2) binding on human beings in virtue of being decreed by God. Now, in §1 above, we saw that Locke thinks that all human beings are naturally oriented to the pursuit of happiness. This is because we are motivated to pursue things if they promise pleasure and to avoid things if they promise pain. It has seemed to many commentators that these two discussions of moral principles are in tension with each other. On the view described in Law, Locke straightforwardly appeals to reason and our ability to understand the nature of God’s attributes to ground our obligation to follow the law of nature. In other words, what is lawful ought to be followed because God wills it and what is unlawful ought to be rejected because it is not willed by God. Because we can straightforwardly see that God is the law-giver and that we are by nature subordinate to Him, we ought to follow the law. By contrast, in the discussion of happiness and pleasure in the Essay, Locke explains that good and evil reduce to what is pleasurable and what is painful. While he does also indicate that the special categories of good and evil—moral good and moral evil—are no more than the conformity or disagreement between our actions and a law, he immediately adds that such conformity or disagreement is followed by rewards or punishments that flow from the lawmaker’s will. From this discussion, then, it is difficult to see whether Locke holds that it is the reward and punishment that binds human beings to act in accordance with the law, or if it is the fact that the law is willed by God.

One way to approach this problem is to suggest that Locke changed his mind. Because of the thirty-year gap between Law and the Essay, we might be tempted to think that the more rationalist picture, where the law and its authority are based on reason, was the young Locke’s view when he wrote Law. This view, the story would go, was replaced by Locke’s more considered and mature view, hedonism. But this approach must be resisted because both theories are present in early and late works. The role of pleasure and pain with respect to morality is present not only in the Essay, but is invoked in Law (passage quoted at the end of §2c), and many other various minor essays written in the years between Law and Essay (for example, ‘Morality’ (c.1677–78) in Political Essays, 267–69). Likewise, the role of the authority of God's will is retained after Law, again evident in various minor essays (for example, ‘Virtue B’ (1681) in Political Essays, 287-88), Government II.6), Locke’s correspondence (for example, to James Tyrrell, 4 August 1690, Correspondence, Vol.4, letter n.1309) and even in the Essay itself (II.xxviii.8). An answer to how we might reconcile these two positions is suggested when we consider the texts where appeals to both theories are found side-by-side in certain passages.

In his essay Of Ethick in General (c. 1686–88) Locke affirms the hedonist view that happiness and misery consist only in pleasure and pain, and that we all naturally seek happiness. But in the very next paragraph, he states that there is an important difference between moral and natural good and evil—the pleasure and pain that are consequences of virtuous and vicious behavior are grounded in the divine will. Locke notes that drinking to excess leads to pain in the form of headache or nausea. This is an example of a natural evil. By contrast, transgressing a law would not have any painful consequences if the law were not decreed by a superior lawmaker. He adds that it is impossible to motivate the actions of rational agents without the promise of pain or pleasure (Of Ethick in General, §8). From these considerations, Locke suggests that the proper foundation of morality, a foundation that will entail an obligation to moral principles, needs two things. First, we need the proof of a law, which presupposes the existence of a lawmaker who is superior to those to whom the law is decreed. The lawmaker has the right to ordain the law and the power to reward and punish. Second, it must be shown that the content of the law is discoverable to humankind (Of Ethick in General, §12). In this text it seems that Locke suggests that both the force and authority of the divine decree and the promise of reward and punishment are necessary for the proper foundation of an obligating moral law.

A similar line of argument is found in the Essay. There, Locke asserts that in order to judge moral success or failure, we need a rule by which to measure and judge action. Further, each rule of this sort has an “enforcement of Good and Evil.” This is because, according to Locke, “where-ever we suppose a Law, suppose also some Reward or Punishment annexed to that Law” (Essay, II.xxviii.6). Locke states that some promise of pleasure or pain is necessary in order to determine the will to pursue or avoid certain actions. Indeed, he puts the point even more strongly, saying that it would be in vain for the intelligent being who decrees the rule of law to so decree without entailing reward or punishment for the obedient or the unfaithful (see also Government, II.7). It seems, then, that reason discovers the fact that a divine law exists and that it derives from the divine will and, as such, is binding. We might think, as Stephen Darwall suggests in The British Moralists and the Internal Ought, that if reason is that which discovers our obligation to the law, the role for reward and punishment is to motivate our obedience to the law. While this succeeds in making room for both the rationalist and hedonist strains in Locke’s view, some other texts seem to indicate that by reason alone we ought to be motivated to follow moral laws.

One striking instance of this kind of suggestion is found in the third book of the Essay where Locke boldly states that “Morality is capable of Demonstration” in the same way as mathematics (Essay, III.xi.16). He explains that once we understand the existence and nature of God as a supreme being who is infinite in power, goodness, and wisdom and on whom we depend, and our own nature “as understanding, rational Beings,” we should be able to see that these two things together provide the foundation of both our duty and the appropriate rules of action. On Locke’s view, with focused attention the measures of right and wrong will become as clear to us as the propositions of mathematics (Essay, IV.iii.18). He gives two examples of such certain moral principles to make the point: (1) “Where there is no Property, there is no Injustice” and (2) “No Government allows absolute Liberty.” He explains that property implies a right to something and injustice is the violation of a right to something. So, if we clearly see the intensional definition of each term, we see that (1) is necessarily true. Similarly, government indicates the establishment of a society based on certain rules, and absolute liberty is the freedom from any and all rules. Again, if we understand the definitions of the two terms in the proposition, it becomes obvious that (2) is necessarily true. And, Locke states, following this logic, 1 and 2 are as certain as the proposition that “a Triangle has three Angles equal to two right ones” (Essay, IV.iii.18). If moral principles have the same status as mathematical principles, it is difficult to see why we would need further inducement to use these principles to guide our behavior. While there is no clear answer to this question, Locke does provide a way to understand the role of reward and punishment in our obligation to moral principles despite the fact that it seems that they ought to obligate by reason alone.

Early in the Essay, over the course of giving arguments against the existence of innate ideas, Locke addresses the possibility of innate moral principles. He begins by saying that for any proposed moral rule human beings can, with good reason, demand justification. This precludes the possibility of innate moral principles because, if they were innate, they would be self-evident and thus would not be candidates for justification. Next, Locke notes that despite the fact that there are no innate moral principles, there are certain principles that are undeniable, for example, that “men should keep their Compacts.” However, when asked why people follow this rule, different answers are given. A “Hobbist” will say that it is because the public requires it, and the “Leviathan” will punish those who disobey the law. A “Heathen” philosopher will say that it is because following such a law is a virtue, which is the highest perfection for human beings. But a Christian philosopher, the category to which Locke belongs, will say that it is because “God, who has the Power of eternal Life and Death, requires it of us” (Essay, I.iii.5). Locke builds on this statement in the following section when he notes that while the existence of God and the truth of our obedience to Him is made manifest by the light of reason, it is possible that there are people who accept the truth of moral principles, and follow them, without knowing or accepting the “true ground of Morality; which can only be the Will and Law of God” (Essay, I.iii.6). Here Locke is suggesting that we can accept a true moral law as binding and follow it as such, but for the wrong reasons. This means that while the Hobbist, the Heathen, and the Christian might all take the same law of keeping one’s compacts to be obligating, only the Christian does it for the right reason—that God’s will requires our obedience to that law. Indeed, Locke states that if we receive truths by revelation they too must be subject to reason, for to follow truths based on revelation alone is insufficient (see Essay, IV.xviii).

Now, to determine the role of pain and pleasure in this story, we turn to Locke’s discussion of the role of pain and pleasure in general. He says that God has joined pains and pleasures to our interaction with many things in our environment in order to alert us to things that are harmful or helpful to the preservation of our bodies (Essay, II.vii.4). But, beyond this, Locke notes that there is another reason that God has joined pleasure and pain to almost all our thoughts and sensations: so that we experience imperfections and dissatisfactions. He states that the kinds of pleasures that we experience in connection to finite things are ephemeral and not representative of complete happiness. This dissatisfaction coupled with the natural drive to obtain happiness opens the possibility of our being led to seek our pleasure in God, where we anticipate a more stable and, perhaps, permanent happiness. Appreciating this reason why pleasure and pain are annexed to most of our ideas will, according to Locke, lead the way to the ultimate aim of the enquiry in human understanding—the knowledge and veneration of God (Essay, II.vii.5–6). So, Locke seems to be suggesting here that pain and pleasure prompt us to find out about God, in whom complete and eternal happiness is possible. This search, in turn, leads us to knowledge of God, which will include the knowledge that He ought to be obeyed in virtue of His decrees alone. Pleasure and pain, reward and punishment, on this interpretation, are the means by which we are led to know God’s nature, which, once known, motivates obedience to His laws. This mechanism supports Locke’s claim that real happiness is to be found in the perfection of our intellectual nature—in embarking on the search for knowledge of God, we embark on the intellectual journey that will lead to the kind of knowledge that brings permanent pleasure. This at least suggests that the knowledge of God has the happy double-effect of leading to both more stable happiness and the understanding that God is to be obeyed in virtue of His divine will alone.

But given that all human beings experience pain and pleasure, Locke needs to explain how it is that certain people are virtuous, having followed the experience of dissatisfaction to arrive at the knowledge of God, and other people are vicious, who seek pleasure and avoid pain for no reason other than their own hedonic sensations.

4. Power, Freedom, and Suspending Desire

a. Passive and Active Powers

In any discussion of ethics, it is important not only to determine what, exactly, counts as virtuous and vicious behavior, but also the extent to which we are in control of our actions. This is important because we want to be able to adequately connect behavior to agents in order to attribute praise or blame, reward or punishment to an agent, we need to be able to see the way in which she is the causal source of her own actions. Locke addresses this issue in one of the longest chapters of the Essay—“Of Power.” In this chapter, Locke describes how he understands the nature of power, the human will, freedom and its connection to happiness, and, finally, the reasons why many (or even most) people do not exercise their freedom in the right kind of way and are unhappy as a result. It is worth noting here that this chapter of the Essay underwent major revisions throughout the five editions of the Essay and in particular between the first and second edition. The present discussion is based on the fourth edition of the Essay (but see the “References and Further Reading” below for articles that discuss the relevance of the changes throughout all five editions).

Locke states that we come to have the idea of “power” by observing the fact that things change over time. Finite objects are changed as a result of interactions with other finite objects (for example fire melts gold) and we notice that our own ideas change either as a result of external stimulus (for example the noise of a jackhammer interrupts the contemplation of a logic problem) or as a result of our own desires (for example hunger interrupts the contemplation of a logic problem). The idea of power always includes some kind of relation to action or change. The passive side of power entails the ability to be changed and the active side of power entails the ability to make change. Our observation of almost all sensible things furnishes us with the idea of passive power. This is because sensible things appear to be in almost constant flux—they are changed by their interaction with other sensible things, with heat, cold, rain, and time. And, Locke adds, such observations give us no fewer instances of the idea of active power, for “whatever Change is observed, the Mind must collect a Power somewhere, able to make that Change” (Essay, II.xxi.4). However, when it comes to active powers, Locke states that the clearest and most distinct idea of active power comes to us from the observation of the operations of our own minds. He elaborates by stating that there are two kinds of activities with which we are familiar: thinking and motion. When we consider body in general, Locke states that it is obvious that we receive no idea of thinking, which only comes from a contemplation of the operations of our own minds. But neither does body provide the idea of the beginning of motion, only of the continuation or transfer of motion. The idea of the beginning of motion, which is the idea associated with the active power of motion, only comes to us when we reflect “on what passes in our selves, where we find by Experience, that barely by willing it, barely by a thought of the Mind, we can move the parts of our Bodies, which were before at rest” (Essay, II.xxi.4). So, it seems, the operation of our minds, in particular the connection between one kind of thought, willing, and a change in either the content of our minds or the orientation of our bodies, provides us with the idea of an active power.

b. The Will

The power to stop, start, or continue an action of the mind or of the body is what Locke calls the will. When the power of the will is exercised, a volition (or willing) occurs. Any action (or forbearance of action) that follows volition is considered voluntary. The power of the will is coupled with the power of the understanding. This latter power is defined as the power of perceiving ideas and their agreement or disagreement with one another. The understanding, then, provides ideas to the mind and the will, depending on the content of these ideas, prefers certain courses of action to others. Locke explains that the will directs action according to its preference—and here we must understand “preference” in the most general sense of inclination, partiality, or taste. In short, the will is attracted to actions that promise the procurement of pleasing things and/or the distancing from displeasing things. The technical term that Locke uses to describe that which determines the will is uneasiness. He elaborates, stating that the reason why any action is continued is “the present satisfaction in it” and the reason why any action is taken to move to a new state is dissatisfaction (Essay, II.xxi.29). Indeed, Locke affirms that uneasiness, at bottom, is really no more than desire, where the mind is disturbed by a “want of some absent good” (Essay, II.xxi.31). So, any pain or discomfort of the mind or body is a motive for the will to command a change of state so as to move from unease to ease. Locke notes that it is a common fact of life that we often experience multiple uneasinesses at one time, all pressing on us and demanding relief. But, he says, when we ask the question of what determines the will at any one moment, the answer is the most pressing uneasiness (Essay, II.xxi.31). Imagine a situation where you are simultaneously experiencing discomfort as a result of hunger and the anxiety of being under-prepared for tomorrow’s philosophy exam. On Locke’s view the most intense or the most pressing of these uneasinesses will determine your will to command the action that will relieve it. This means that no matter how much you want to stay at the library to study, if hunger comes to be the more pressing than the desire to pass the exam, hunger will determine the will to act, commanding the action that will result in the procurement of food.

While Locke states that the most pressing uneasiness determines the will, he adds that it does so “for the most part, but not always.” This is because he takes the mind to have the power to “suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires” (Essay, II.xxi.47). While a desire is suspended, Locke says, our mind, being temporarily freed from the discomfort of the want for the thing desired, has the opportunity to consider the relative worth of that thing. The idea here is that with appropriate deliberation about the value of the desired thing we will come to see which things are really worth pursuing and which are better left alone. And, Locke states, the conclusion at which we arrive after this intellectual endeavor of consideration and examination will indicate what, exactly, we take to be part of our happiness. And, in turn, by a mechanism that Locke does not describe in any detail, our uneasiness and desire for that thing will change to reflect whether we concluded that the thing does, indeed, play a role in our happiness or not (Essay, II.xxi.56). The problem is that there is no clear explanation for how, exactly, the power to suspend works. Despite this, Locke nowhere indicates that suspension is an action of the mind that is determined by anything other than volition of the will. We know that Locke takes all acts of the will to be determined by uneasiness. So, suspending our desires must be the result of uneasiness for something. Investigating how Locke understands human freedom and judgment will allow us to see what, exactly, we are uneasy for when we are determined to suspend our desires.

c. Freedom

When the nature of the human will is under discussion, we often want to know the extent of this faculty’s freedom. The reason why this question is important is because we want to see how autonomously the will can act. Typically, the question takes the form of: is the will free? Locke unequivocally denies that the will is free, implying, in fact, that it is a category mistake to ask the question at all. This is because, on his view, both the will and freedom are powers of agents, and it is a mistake to think that one power (the will) can have as a property a second power (freedom) (Essay, II.xxi.20). Instead, Locke thinks that the right question to pose is whether the agent is free. He defines freedom in the following way:

[T]he Idea of Liberty, is the Idea of a Power in any Agent to do or forbear any particular Action, according to the determination or thought of the mind, whereby either of them is preferr’d to the other; where either of them is not in the Power of the Agent to be produced by him according to his Volition here he is not a Liberty, that Agent is under Necessity. (Essay, II.xxi.8)

So, Locke considers that an agent is free in acting when her action is connected to her volition in the right kind of way. That is, when her action (or forbearance of action) follows from her volition, she is free. And, her volition is determined by the “thought of the mind” that indicates which action is preferred.

Notice here that Locke takes an agent to be free in acting when she acts according to her preference—this means that her actions are determined by her preference. This plainly shows that Locke does not endorse a kind of freedom of indifference, according to which the will can choose to command an action other than the thing most preferred at a given moment. This is the kind of freedom most often associated with indeterminism. Freedom, then, for Locke, is no more than the ability to execute the action that is taken to result in the most pleasure at a given moment. The problem with this way of defining freedom is that it seems unable to account for the kinds of actions we typically take to be emblematic of virtuous or vicious behavior. This is because we tend to think that the power of freedom is a power that allows us to avoid vicious actions, perhaps especially those that are pleasurable, in order to pursue a righteous path instead. For instance, on the traditional Christian picture, when we wonder about why God would allow Adam to sin, the response given is that Adam was created as a free being. While God could have created beings that, like automata, unfailingly followed the good and the true, He saw that it was all things considered better to create beings that were free to choose their own actions. This decision was made despite the fact that God foresaw the sinful use to which this freedom would be put. This traditional view explains Adam’s sin in the following way: Adam knew that it was God’s commandment that he was not to eat of the tree of knowledge. Adam also knew that following God’s commandment was the right thing to do. So, in the moment where he was tempted to eat the fruit of the tree of knowledge, he knew it was the wrong thing to do, but did it anyway. This is because, the story goes, and in that moment he was free to decide whether to follow the commandment or to give in to temptation. Of his own free choice, Adam decided to follow temptation. This means that in the moment of original sin, both following God’s commandment and eating the fruit were live options for Adam, and he chose the fruit of his own agency.

Now, on Locke’s system, a different explanation obtains. Given his definition of freedom, it is difficult, at least prima facie, to see how Adam could be blamed for choosing the fruit over the commandment. For, according to Locke, an agent acts freely when her actions are determined by her volitions. So, if Adam’s greatest uneasiness was for the fruit, and the act of eating the fruit was the result of his will commanding such action based on his preference, then he acted freely. But, on this understanding of freedom, it is difficult to see how, exactly, Adam can be morally blamed for eating the fruit. The question now becomes: is Adam to be blamed for anticipating more pleasure from the consumption of the fruit than from following God’s command? In other words, was it possible for Adam to alter the intensity of his desire for the fruit? It seems that on Locke’s view, the answer must be connected to one of the powers he takes human beings to possess—the power to suspend desires. And, in certain passages of the Essay, Locke implies that suspending desires and freedom are linked, suggesting that while agents are acting freely whenever their volitions and actions are linked in the right kind of way, there is, perhaps, a proper use of the power to act freely.

d. Judgment

Locke asserts that the “highest perfection of intellectual nature” is the “pursuit of true and solid happiness.” He adds that taking care not to mistake imaginary happiness for real happiness is “the necessary foundation of our liberty.” And, he writes that the more closely we are focused on the pursuit of true happiness, which is our greatest good, the less our wills are determined to command actions to pursue lesser goods that are not representative of the true good (Essay, II.xxi.51). In other words, the more we are determined by true happiness, the more we will to suspend our desires for lesser things. This suggests that Locke takes there to be a right way to use our power of freedom. Locke indicates that there are instances where it is impossible to resist a particular desire—when a violent passion strikes, for instance. He also states, however, that aside from these kinds of violent passions, we are always able to suspend our desire for any thing in order to give ourselves the time and the emotional distance from the thing desired in which to consider the worth of thing relative to our general goal: true happiness. True happiness, or real bliss, on Locke’s view, is to be found in the pursuit of things that are true intrinsic goods, which promise “exquisite and endless Happiness” in the next life (Essay, II.xxi.70). In other words, true good is something like the Beatific Vision.

Now, Locke admits that it is a common experience to be carried by our wills towards things that we know do not play a role in our overall and true happiness. However, while he allows that the pursuit of things that promise pleasure, even if only a temporary pleasure, represents the action of a free agent, he also says that it is possible for us to be “at Liberty in respect of willing” when we choose “a remote Good as an end to be pursued” (Essay, II.xxi.56). The central thing to note here is that Locke is drawing a distinction between immediate and remote goods. The difference between these two kinds of goods is temporal. For instance, acting to obtain the pleasure of intoxication is to pursue an immediate good while acting to obtain the pleasure of health is to pursue a remote good. So, we can suppose here that Locke is suggesting that forgoing immediate goods and privileging remote goods is characteristic of the right use of liberty (but see Rickless for an alternative interpretation). If this is so, it is certainly not a difficult suggestion to accept. Indeed, it is fairly straightforwardly clear that many immediate pleasures do not, in the end, contribute to overall and long-lasting happiness.

The question now, and it is a question that Locke himself poses, is “How Men come often to prefer the worse to the better; and to chase that, which, by their own Confession, has made them miserable” (Essay, II.xxi.56). Locke gives two answers. First, bad luck can account for people not pursuing their true happiness. For instance, someone who is afflicted with an illness, injury, or tragedy is consumed by her pain and is thus unable to adequately focus on remote pleasures. Quoting Locke’s second answer “Other uneasinesses arise from our desire of absent good; which desires always bear proportion to, and depend on the judgment we make, and the relish we have of any absent good; in both which we are apt to be variously misled, and that by our own fault” (Essay, II.xxi.57).

Here Locke states that our own faulty judgment is to blame for our preferring the worse to the better. This is because, on his view, the uneasiness we have for any given object is directly proportional to the judgments we make about the merit of the things to which we are attracted. So, if we are most uneasy for immediate pleasures, it is our own fault because we have judged these things to be best for us. In this way, Locke makes room in his system for praiseworthiness and blameworthiness with respect to our desires: absent illness, injury, or tragedy, we ourselves are responsible for endorsing, through judgment, our uneasinesses. He continues, stating that the major reason why we often misjudge the value of things for our true happiness is that our current state fools us into thinking that we are, in fact, truly happy. Because it is difficult for us to consider the state of true, eternal happiness, we tend to think that in those moments when we enjoy pleasure and feel no uneasiness, we are truly happy. But such thoughts are mistaken on his view. Indeed, as Locke says, the greatest reason why so few people are moved to pursue the greatest, remote good is that most people are convinced that they can be truly happy without it.

The cause of our mistaken judgments is the fact that it is very difficult for us to compare present and immediate pleasures and pains with future or remote pleasures and pains. In fact, Locke likens this difficulty to the trouble we typically experience in correctly estimating the size of distant objects. When objects are close to us, it is easy to determine their size. When they are far away, it is much more difficult. Likewise, he says, for pleasures and pains. He notes that if every sip of alcohol were accompanied by headache and nausea, no one would ever drink. But, “the fallacy of a little difference in time” provides the space for us to mistakenly judge that the alcohol contributes to our true happiness (Essay, II.xxi.63). We experience this difficulty of judging remote pleasures and pains due to the “weak and narrow Constitution of our Minds” (Essay, II.xxi.64). The condition of our minds makes it easy for us to think that there could be no greater good than the relief of being unburdened of a present pain. In order to correct this problem and convince a man to judge that his greatest good is to be found in a remote thing, Locke says that all we must do is convince him that “Virtue and Religion are necessary to his Happiness” (Essay, II.xxi.60). Locke explains that a “due consideration will do it in most cases; and practice, application, and custom in most” (Essay, II.xxi.69). The suggestion is that contemplation and deliberation alone may be sufficient to correct our problem of considering all immediate pleasures and pains to be greater than any future ones. And, if that does not work, practice and habit can also correct this problem. By practice and exposure, we can, according to Locke, change the agreeableness or disagreeableness of things. It seems, then, that the power to suspend desire must be the power to reject immediate pleasures in favor of the pursuit of remote or future pleasures. However, it seems that in order to suspend in this way, we must already have judged that these immediate pleasures are not representative of the true good. For, without this kind of prior judgment, it seems that we would not be in a position to suspend in the way that is required. This is because absent the prior judgment, there would be no reason for the uneasiness we felt for the perceived good to not determine the will. The question to resolve now is how to get ourselves into a position where we are uneasy for the remote, true good and can suspend our desires for immediate pleasures. In other words, we must determine how we can come to seriously judge immediate pleasures to not have a part in our true happiness.

5. Living the Moral Life

In order to behave in a way that will lead us to the greatest and truest happiness, we must come to judge the remote and future good, the “unspeakable,” “infinite,” and “eternal” joys of heaven to be our greatest and thus most pleasurable good (Essay, II.xxi.37–38). But, on Locke’s view, our actions are always determined by the thing we are most uneasy about at any given moment. So, it seems, we need to cultivate the uneasiness for the infinite joys of heaven. But if, as Locke suggests, the human condition is such that our minds, in their weak and narrow states, judge immediate pleasures to be representative of the greatest good, it is difficult to see how, exactly, we can circumvent this weakened state in order to suspend our more terrestrial desires and thus have the space to correctly judge which things will lead to our true happiness. While in the Essay Locke does not say as much as we might like on this topic, elsewhere in his writings we can get a sense for how he might respond to this question.

In 1684, Locke was asked by his friend Edward Clarke, for advice about raising and educating his children. In 1693, Locke’s musings on this topic were published as Some Thoughts Concerning Education (hereafter: Education). This text provides insight into the importance that Locke places on the connection between the pursuit of true happiness and early childhood education in general. Locke begins his discussion by noting that happiness is crucially dependent on the existence of both a sound mind and a sound body. He adds that it sometimes happens that by a great stroke of luck, someone is born whose constitution is so strong that they do not need help from others to direct their minds towards the things that will make them happy. But this is an extraordinarily rare occurrence. Indeed, Locke notes: “I think I may say, that, of all the men we meet with, nine parts of ten are what they are, good or evil, useful or not, by their education” (Education, §1). It is the education we receive as young children, on Locke’s view, that determines how adept we are at targeting the right objects in order to secure our happiness. He observes that the minds of young children are easily distracted by all kinds of sensory stimuli and notes that the first step to developing a mind that is focused on the right kind of things is to ensure that the body is healthy. Indeed, the objective in physical health is to get the body in the perfect state to be able to obey and carry out the mind’s commands. The more difficult part of this equation is training the mind to “be disposed to consent to nothing, but what may be suitable to the dignity and excellency of a rational creature” (Education, §31). And Locke goes further still, stating that the foundation of all virtue is to be placed in the ability of a human being to “deny himself his own desires, cross his own inclinations, and purely follow what reason directs as best, though the appetite lean the other way” (Education, §33). The way to do this, he says, is to resist immediately present pleasures and pains and to wait to act until reason has determined the value of the desirable things in one’s environment.

Locke states that we must recognize the difference between “natural wants” and “wants of fancy.” The former are the kinds of desires that must be obeyed and that no amount of reasoning will allow us to give up. The latter, however, are created. Locke states that parents and teachers must ensure that children develop the habit of resisting any kind of created fancy, thus keeping the mind free from desires for things that do not lead to true happiness (Education, §107). If parents and teachers are successful in blocking the development of “wants of fancy,” Locke thinks that the children who benefit from this success will become adults who will be “allowed greater liberty” because they will be more closely connected to the dictates of reason and not the dictates of passion (Education, §108). So, in order to live the moral life and listen to reason over passions, it seems that we need to have had the benefit of conscientious care-givers in our infancy and youth (see also Government, II.63). This raises the difficulty of how to connect an individual’s moral successes or failures with the individual herself. For, if she had the bad moral luck of unthinking or careless parents and teachers, it seems difficult to see how she could be blamed for failing to follow a virtuous path.

One way of approaching this difficulty is to recall that Locke takes the content of law of nature, the moral law decreed by God, to be the preservation both of ourselves and of the other people in our communities in order to glorify God (Law, IV). The dictate to help to preserve the other people in our community shifts some of the moral burden from the individual onto the community. This means that it is every individual’s responsibility to do all they can, all things considered, to preserve themselves and to ensure, to the best of their ability, that the children in their communities are raised to avoid developing wants of fancy. In this way, children will develop the habit of suspending their desires for terrestrial pleasures and focusing their efforts on attaining the true happiness that results from acting to secure remote goods.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
    • This is the critical edition of Locke’s Essay. The body of the text is based on the fourth edition of the Essay and all the changes from the first edition through the fifth (1689, 1694, 1695, 1700, 1706) are indicated in the footnotes. The text also includes a comprehensive forward by Nidditch. Note that Locke’s orthography, grammar, and style are often quite different from the way that academic English is written today. In the citations from this text in particular, all emphases, capitalization, and odd spelling are original to Locke.
  • Essays on the Laws of Nature. Edited and translated by W. von Leyden. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954.
    • This edition includes both the original Latin and the English translation of the essays. It also includes Locke’s valedictory speech as censor of moral philosophy at Christ Church and some other shorter pieces of writing. Von Leyden’s introduction provides a very detailed discussion of the sources of Locke’s arguments in these essays, the arguments themselves, and the relations these arguments bear to other of Locke’s writings. It is worth noting here that on von Leyden’s interpretation, it is not possible to render Locke’s discussion of natural law consistent with his endorsement of a hedonistic motivational system in later works.
  • Political Essays. Edited by Mark Goldie. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
    • This collection includes major writings on politics and government, including Essays on the Laws of Nature, Of Ethick in General, and An Essay on Toleration, in addition to many other minor essays.
  • The Correspondence of John Locke, in Eight Volumes. Edited by E.S. De Beer. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1976–89.
    • A complete database of Locke’s correspondence including notes about his correspondents, notes about events and proper names mentioned in letters, as well as signposts for what was going on in Locke’s life at the time he was writing. The first volume of the collection includes an exhaustive introduction to Locke’s life, work, and contacts in the academic and social world; an explanation of how Locke’s letters were preserved; a discussion of previous publications of Locke’s correspondence and how they relate to this collection; and information about transcription practices, including details about editorial grammar decision and dating of the letters.
  • The Works of John Locke, in Nine Volumes, 12th edition. London: Rivington, 1824.
    • This collection includes most of Locke’s longer texts, some shorter texts and a selection of letters. Among other things, the collection contains: Essay (vols.1 and 2), his correspondence with Stillingfleet (vol.3), Two Treatises of Government (vol.4), Letters on Toleration (vol.5), The Reasonableness of Christianity (vol.6), notes on St. Paul's Epistles (vol.7), Some Thoughts Concerning Education and A Discourse of Miracles (vol.8), and a selection of letters (vol.9).

b. Secondary Sources: Books

  • Aaron, Richard I. John Locke. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1971.
    • This is a comprehensive study of Locke’s life and works and includes fifteen very nice pages on Locke’s moral philosophy. Importantly, Aaron concludes that Locke fails to provide his readers  with a science of morals and, in fact, that Locke’s disparate comments about ethics and moral principles cannot be reconciled.
  • Colman, John. John Locke’s Moral Philosophy. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1983.
    • In this study, Colman addresses the major themes and problems of Locke’s moral theory including the connection between law and obligation, and the connection between moral principles and    demonstrability.
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal 'Ought': 1640–1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • This is a deep and broad study of moral philosophy from the mid 17th to the mid 18th century. Locke is one among several central figures under discussion. The reader greatly benefits from Darwall’s careful discussions of the theoretical connections between Locke and his contemporaries and his influences on the topics of natural law, autonomy, motivation, duty, and freedom.
  • Lolordo, Antonia. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
    • In this study, Lolordo draws on different parts of the Essay in order to see Locke’s theory of agency. She argues in favor of the interpretation according to which there are two senses of freedom in Locke’s view, one of which is properly used to attain the goal proper to a moral agent. Of particular interest is her discussion that links Locke’s comments about personal identity to moral agency and her claim that, for Locke, metaphysics is unnecessary for ethics.
  • Mabbot, J.D. John Locke. London: Macmillan Press, 1973.
    • This is a study of Locke’s philosophical system that focuses on knowledge acquisition, logic and language, ethics and theology, and political theory. In his discussion of ethics and theology, Mabbot traces Locke’s discussions of moral principles, their demonstrability, and their binding force through The Two Treatises of GovernmentThe Essays on the Laws of Nature, and An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Schouls, Peter A. Reasoned Freedom: John Locke and Enlightenment. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
    • This is a defense of the view that Locke was a great influence on enlightenment thought, in particular in the domains of reason and freedom. Schouls also points out what he takes to be       many inconsistencies across and sometimes within Locke’s texts.
  • Yaffe, Gideon. Liberty Worth the Name: Locke on Free Agency. New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 2000.
    • This is a book-length study of Locke’s view of human freedom. The content includes careful analysis of the chapter 'Of Power' of the Essay in addition to comments about how this chapter is connected to Locke’s discussion of personal identity. Yaffe defends an interpretation according to which Locke’s view contains two definitions of freedom, only one of which is “worth the name”—the kind of freedom that allows the pursuit of true good.

c. Secondary Sources: Articles

  • Chappell, Vere. “Locke on the Intellectual Basis of Sin.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 32 (1994): 197–207.
  • Chappell, Vere. “Locke on the Liberty of the Will.” In Locke’s Philosophy: Content and Context. Edited by G.A.J. Rogers, 101–21. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Chappell, Vere. “Power in Locke’s Essay.” In The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s “An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.” Edited by Lex Newman, 130–56. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
    • In these articles, Chappell advances the interpretation that changes made in the fifth edition of the Essay indicate that Locke changed his view about human freedom.
  • Darwall, Stephen. “The Foundations of Morality,” In The Cambridge Companion to Early Modern Philosophy. Edited by Donald Rutherford, 221–49.
    • This paper canvasses the main themes explored by and influences on early modern moral theories, including Locke’s.
  • Glauser, Richard. “Thinking and Willing in Locke’s Theory of Human Freedom,” Dialogue 42 (2003): 695–724.
    • Glauser argues that Locke’s view remains consistent across the changes made in the various editions of the Essay.
  • Magri, Tito. “Locke, Suspension of Desire, and the Remote Good,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 8 (2000): 55–70.
    • Magri argues that Locke’s view changes over the course of the different editions of the Essay, in particular that he moves from having an “internalist” view of motivation to having an “externalist” view of motivation. Magri casts doubt on the consistency of Locke’s position.
  • Mathewson, Mark D. “John Locke and the Problems of Moral Knowledge,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 87 (2006): 509–26.
    • Mathewson argues that Locke’s comments about the nature of moral ideas leads to moral subjectivity and relativism.
  • Rickless, Samuel. “Locke on Active Power, Freedom, and Moral Agency,” Locke Studies 13 (2013): 31–51.
  • Rickless, Samuel. “Locke on the Freedom to Will.”  Locke Newsletter 31 (2000): 43–68.
    • In these papers, Rickless argues that Locke holds one and only one definition of freedom: the ability to act according to our volitions. According to Rickless, Locke holds the same definition of freedom as Hobbes. The 2013 paper is a direct argument against the interpretation advanced by Lolordo in Locke’s Moral Man.
  • Schneewind, J.B. “Locke’s Moral Philosophy,” The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Edited by Vere Chappell. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • Schneewind is one commentator who thinks that Locke’s moral philosophy ends up in a contradiction between the natural law view and hedonism.
  • Walsh, Julie. “Locke and the Power to Suspend Desire,” Locke Studies, 14 (2014).
    • Walsh argues that Locke’s view remains consistent and coherent across the various editions of the Essay and emphasizes the role played by suspension and judgment in attaining true happiness.


Author Information

Julie Walsh
Université du Québec à Montréal

John Locke (1632—1704)

LockeJohn Locke was among the most famous philosophers and political theorists of the 17th century.  He is often regarded as the founder of a school of thought known as British Empiricism, and he made foundational contributions to modern theories of limited, liberal government. He was also influential in the areas of theology, religious toleration, and educational theory. In his most important work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke set out to offer an analysis of the human mind and its acquisition of knowledge. He offered an empiricist theory according to which we acquire ideas through our experience of the world. The mind is then able to examine, compare, and combine these ideas in numerous different ways. Knowledge consists of a special kind of relationship between different ideas. Locke’s emphasis on the philosophical examination of the human mind as a preliminary to the philosophical investigation of the world and its contents represented a new approach to philosophy, one which quickly gained a number of converts, especially in Great Britain. In addition to this broader project, the Essay contains a series of more focused discussions on important, and widely divergent, philosophical themes. In politics, Locke is best known as a proponent of limited government. He uses a theory of natural rights to argue that governments have obligations to their citizens, have only limited powers over their citizens, and can ultimately be overthrown by citizens under certain circumstances. He also provided powerful arguments in favor of religious toleration. This article attempts to give a broad overview of all key areas of Locke’s thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. The Main Project of the Essay
    1. Ideas
    2. The Critique of Nativism
    3. Idea Acquisition
    4. Language
    5. The Account of Knowledge
  3. Special Topics in the Essay
    1. Primary and Secondary Qualities
    2. Mechanism
    3. Volition and Agency
    4. Personhood and Personal Identity
    5. Real and Nominal Essences
    6. Religious Epistemology
  4. Political Philosophy
    1. The Two Treatises
    2. Property
    3. Toleration
  5. Theology
  6. Education
  7. Locke’s Influence
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Locke’s Works
    2. Recommended Reading

1. Life and Works

John Locke was born in 1632 in Wrington, a small village in southwestern England. His father, also named John, was a legal clerk and served with the Parliamentary forces in the English Civil War. His family was well-to-do, but not of particularly high social or economic standing. Locke spent his childhood in the West Country and as a teenager was sent to Westminster School in London.

Locke was successful at Westminster and earned a place at Christ Church, Oxford. He was to remain in Oxford from 1652 until 1667. Although he had little appreciation for the traditional scholastic philosophy he learned there, Locke was successful as a student and after completing his undergraduate degree he held a series of administrative and academic posts in the college. Some of Locke’s duties included instruction of undergraduates. One of his earliest substantive works, the Essays on the Law of Nature, was developed in the course of his teaching duties. Much of Locke’s intellectual effort and energy during his time at Oxford, especially during his later years there, was devoted to the study of medicine and natural philosophy (what we would now call science). Locke read widely in these fields, participated in various experiments, and became acquainted with Robert Boyle and many other notable natural philosophers. He also undertook the normal course of education and training to become a physician.

Locke left Oxford for London in 1667 where he became attached to the family of Anthony Ashley Cooper (then Lord Ashley, later the Earl of Shaftesbury). Locke may have played a number of roles in the household, mostly likely serving as tutor to Ashley’s son. In London, Locke continued to pursue his interests in medicine and natural philosophy. He formed a close working relationship with Thomas Sydenham, who later became one the most famous physicians of the age. He made a number of contacts within the newly formed Royal Society and became a member in 1668. He also acted as the personal physician to Lord Ashley. Indeed, on one occasion Locke participated in a very delicate surgical operation which Ashley credited with saving his life. Ashley was one of the most prominent English politicians at the time. Through his patronage Locke was able to hold a series of governmental posts. Most of his work related to policies in England’s American and Caribbean colonies. Most importantly, this was the period in Locke’s life when he began the project which would culminate in his most famous work, the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. The two earliest drafts of that work date from 1671. He was to continue work on this project intermittentlyfor nearly twenty years.

Locke travelled in France for several years starting in 1675. When he returned to England it was only to be for a few years. The political scene had changed greatly while Locke was away. Shaftesbury (as Ashley was now known) was out of favor and Locke’s association with him had become a liability. It was around this time that Locke composed his most famous political work, the Two Treatises Concerning Government. Although the Two Treatises would not be published until 1689 they show that he had already solidified his views on the nature and proper form of government. Following Shaftesbury’s death Locke fled to the Netherlands to escape political persecution. While there Locke travelled a great deal (sometimes for his own safety) and worked on two projects. First, he continued work on the Essay. Second, he wrote a work entitled Epistola de Tolerantia, which was published anonymously in 1689. Locke’s experiences in England, France, and the Netherlands convinced him that governments should be much more tolerant of religious diversity than was common at the time.

Following the Glorious Revolution of 1688-1689 Locke was able to return to England. He published both the Essay and the Two Treatises (the second anonymously) shortly after his return. He initially stayed in London but soon moved to the home of Francis and Damaris Masham in the small village of Oates, Essex. Damaris Masham, who was the daughter of a notable philosopher named Ralph Cudworth, had become acquainted with Locke several years before. The two formed a very close friendship which lasted until Locke’s death. During this period Locke kept busy working on politics, toleration, philosophy, economics, and educational theory.

Locke engaged in a number of controversies during his life, including a notable one with Jonas Proast over toleration. But Locke’s most famous and philosophically important controversy was with Edward Stillingfleet, the Bishop of Worcester. Stillingfleet, in addition to being a powerful political and theological figure, was an astute and forceful critic. The two men debated a number of the positions in the Essay in a series of published letters.

In his later years Locke devoted much of his attention to theology. His major work in this field was The Reasonableness of Christianity, published (again anonymously) in 1695. This work was controversial because Locke argued that many beliefs traditionally believed to be mandatory for Christians were unnecessary. Locke argued for a highly ecumenical form of Christianity. Closer to the time of his death Locke wrote a work on the Pauline Epistles. The work was unfinished, but published posthumously. A short work on miracles also dates from this time and was published posthumously.

Locke suffered from health problems for most of his adult life. In particular, he had respiratory ailments which were exacerbated by his visits to London where the air quality was very poor. His health took a turn for the worse in 1704 and he became increasingly debilitated. He died on 28 October 1704 while Damaris Masham was reading him the Psalms. He was buried at High Laver, near Oates. He wrote his own epitaph which was both humble and forthright.

2. The Main Project of the Essay

According to Locke’s own account the motivation for writing the Essay came to him while debating an unrelated topic with friends. He reports that they were able to make little headway on this topic and that they very quickly met with a number of confusions and difficulties. Locke realized that to make progress on this topic it was first necessary to examine something more fundamental: the human understanding. It was “necessary to examine our own Abilities, and see, what Objects our Understandings were, or were not fitted to deal with.” (Epistle, 7).

Locke’s insight was that before we can analyze the world and our access to it we have to know something about ourselves. We need to know how we acquire knowledge. We also need to know which areas of inquiry we are well suited to and which are epistemically closed to us, that is, which areas are such that we could not know them even in principle. We further need to know what knowledge consists in.  In keeping with these questions, at the very outset of the Essay Locke writes that it is his “Purpose enquire into the Original, Certainty, and Extent of humane Knowledge; together, with the Grounds and Degrees of Belief, Opinion, and Assent.” (1.1.2, 42). Locke thinks that it is only once we understand our cognitive capabilities that we can suitably direct our researches into the world. This may have been what Locke had in mind when he claimed that part of his ambition in the Essay was to be an “Under-Laborer” who cleared the ground and laid the foundations for the work of famous scientists like Robert Boyle and Isaac Newton.

The Essay is divided into four books with each book contributing to Locke’s overall goal of examining the human mind with respect to its contents and operations. In Book I Locke rules out one possible origin of our knowledge. He argues that our knowledge cannot have been innate. This sets up Book II in which Locke argues that all of our ideas come from experience. In this book he seeks to give an account of how even ideas like God, infinity, and space could have been acquired through our perceptual access to the world and our mental operations. Book III is something of a digression as Locke turns his attention to language and the role it plays in our theorizing. Locke’s main goal here is cautionary, he thinks language is often an obstacle to understanding and he offers some recommendations to avoid confusion. Finally, Book IV discusses knowledge, belief, and opinion. Locke argues that knowledge consists of special kinds of relations between ideas and that we should regulate our beliefs accordingly.

a. Ideas

The first chapter of the Essay contains an apology for the frequent use of the word “idea” in the book. According to Locke, ideas are the fundamental units of mental content and so play an integral role in his explanation of the human mind and his account of our knowledge. Locke was not the first philosopher to give ideas a central role; Descartes, for example, had relied heavily on them in explaining the human mind. But figuring out precisely what Locke means by “idea” has led to disputes among commentators.

One place to begin is with Locke’s own definition. He claims that by “idea” he means “whatsoever is the Object of the Understanding when a Man thinks…whatever is meant by Phantasm, Notion, Species, or whatever it is, which the Mind can be employ’d about in thinking.” (1.1.8, 47). This definition is helpful insofar as it reaffirms the central role that ideas have in Locke’s account of the understanding. Ideas are the sole entities upon which our minds work. Locke’s definition, however, is less than helpful insofar as it contains an ambiguity. On one reading, ideas are mental objects. The thought is that when an agent perceives an external world object like an apple there is some thing in her mind which represents that apple. So when an agent considers an apple what she is really doing is thinking about the idea of that apple. On a different reading, ideas are mental actions. The thought here is that when an agent perceives an apple she is really perceiving the apple in a direct, unmediated way. The idea is the mental act of making perceptual contact with the external world object. In recent years, most commentators have adopted the first of these two readings. But this debate will be important in the discussion of knowledge below.

b. The Critique of Nativism

The first of the Essay’s four books is devoted to a critique of nativism, the doctrine that some ideas are innate in the human mind, rather than received in experience. It is unclear precisely who Locke’s targets in this book are, though Locke does cite Herbert of Cherbury and other likely candidates include René Descartes, the Cambridge Platonists, and a number of lesser known Anglican theologians. Finding specific targets, however, might not be that important given that much of what Locke seeks to do in Book I is motivate and make plausible the alternative account of idea acquisition that he offers in Book II.

The nativist view which Locke attacks in Book I holds that human beings have mental content which is innate in the mind. This means that there are certain ideas (units of mental content) which were neither acquired via experience nor constructed by the mind out of ideas received in experience. The most popular version of this position holds that there are certain ideas which God planted in all minds at the moment of their creation.

Locke attacks both the view that we have any innate principles (for example, the whole is greater than the part, do unto others as you would have done unto you, etc.) as well as the view that there are any innate singular ideas (for example, God, identity, substance,  and so forth). The main thrust of Locke’s argument lies in pointing out that none of the mental content alleged to be innate is universally shared by all humans. He notes that children and the mentally disabled, for example, do not have in their minds an allegedly innate complex thought like “equals taken from equals leave equals”. He also uses evidence from travel literature to point out that many non-Europeans deny what were taken to be innate moral maxims and that some groups even lack the idea of a God. Locke takes the fact that not all humans have these ideas as evidence that they were not implanted by God in humans minds, and that they are therefore acquired rather than innate.

There is one misunderstanding which it is important to avoid when considering Locke’s anti-nativism. The misunderstanding is, in part, suggested by Locke’s claim that the mind is like a tabula rasa (a blank slate) prior to sense experience. This makes it sound as though the mind is nothing prior to the advent of ideas. In fact, Locke’s position is much more nuanced. He makes it clear that the mind has any number of inherent capacities, predispositions, and inclinations prior to receiving any ideas from sensation. His anti-nativist point is just that none of these is triggered or exercised until the mind receives ideas from sensation. 

c. Idea Acquisition

In Book II Locke offers his alternative theory of how the human mind comes to be furnished with the ideas it has. Every day we think of complex things like orange juice, castles, justice, numbers, and motion. Locke’s claim is that the ultimate origin of all of these ideas lies in experience: “Experience: In that, all our Knowledge is founded; and from that it ultimately derives itself. Our Observation employ’d either about external, sensible Objects; or about the internal Operations of our Minds, perceived and reflected on by ourselves, is that, which supplies our Understandings with all the material of thinking. These two are the Fountains of Knowledge, from whence all the Ideas we have, or can naturally have, do spring.” (2.1.2, 104).

In the above passage Locke allows for two distinct types of experience. Outer experience, or sensation, provides us with ideas from the traditional five senses. Sight gives us ideas of colors, hearing gives us ideas of sounds, and so on. Thus, my idea of a particular shade of green is a product of seeing a fern. And my idea of a particular tone is the product of my being in the vicinity of a piano while it was being played. Inner experience, or reflection, is slightly more complicated. Locke thinks that the human mind is incredibly active; it is constantly performing what he calls operations. For example, I often remember past birthday parties, imagine that I was on vacation, desire a slice of pizza, or doubt that England will win the World Cup. Locke believes that we are able to notice or experience our mind performing these actions and when we do we receive ideas of reflection. These are ideas such as memory, imagination, desire, doubt, judgment, and choice.

Locke’s view is that experience (sensation and reflection) issues us with simple ideas. These are the minimal units of mental content; each simple idea is “in itself uncompounded, [and] contains in it nothing but one uniform Appearance, or Conception in the mind, and is not distinguishable into different Ideas.” (2.2.1, 119). But many of my ideas are not simple ideas. My idea of a glass of orange juice or my idea of the New York subway system, for example, could not be classed a simple ideas. Locke calls ideas like these complex ideas. His view is that complex ideas are the product of combining our simple ideas together in various ways. For example, my complex idea of a glass of orange juice consists of various simple ideas (the color orange, the feeling of coolness, a certain sweet taste, a certain acidic taste, and so forth) combined together into one object. Thus, Locke believes our ideas are compositional. Simple ideas combine to form complex ideas. And these complex ideas can be combined to form even more complex ideas.

We are now in a position to understand the character of Locke’s empiricism. He is committed to the view that all of our ideas, everything we can possibly think of, can be broken down into simple ideas received in experience. The bulk of Book II is devoted to making this empiricism plausible. Locke does this both by undertaking an examination of the various abilities that the human mind has (memory, abstraction, volition, and so forth) and by offering an account of how even abstruse ideas like space, infinity, God, and causation could be constructed using only the simple ideas received in experience.

Our complex ideas are classified into three different groups: substances, modes, and relations. Ideas of substances are ideas of things which are thought to exist independently. Ordinary objects like desks, sheep, and mountains fall into this group. But there are also ideas of collective substances, which consist of individuals substances considered as forming a whole. A group of individual buildings might be considered a town. And a group of individual men and women might be considered together as an army. In addition to describing the way we think about individual substances, Locke also has an interesting discussion of substance-in-general. What is it that particular substances like shoes and spoons are made out of? We could suggest that they are made out of leather and metal. But the question could be repeated, what are leather and metal made of? We might respond that they are made of matter. But even here, Locke thinks we can ask what matter is made of. What gives rise to the properties of matter? Locke claims that we don’t have a very clear idea here. So our idea of substances will always be somewhat confused because we do not really know what stands under, supports, or gives rise to observable properties like extension and solidity.

Ideas of modes are ideas of things which are dependent on substances in some way. In general, this taxonomic category can be somewhat tricky. It does not seem to have a clear parallel in contemporary metaphysics, and it is sometimes thought to be a mere catch-all category for things which are neither substances nor relations. But it is helpful to think of modes as being like features of substances; modes are “such complex Ideas, which however compounded, contain not in them the supposition of subsisting by themselves, but are considered as Dependences on, or Affections of Substances.” (2.12.4, 165). Modes come in two types: simple and mixed. Simple modes are constructed by combining a large number of a single type of simple ideas together. For example, Locke believes there is a simple idea of unity. Our complex idea of the number seven, for example, is a simple mode and is constructed by concatenating seven simple ideas of unity together. Locke uses this category to explain how we think about a number of topics relating to number, space, time, pleasure and pain, and cognition. Mixed modes, on the other hand, involve combining together simple ideas of more than one kind. A great many ideas fall into this category. But the most important ones are moral ideas. Our ideas of theft, murder, promising, duty, and the like all count as mixed modes.

Ideas of relations are ideas that involve more than one substance. My idea of a husband, for example, is more than the idea of an individual man. It also must include the idea of another substance, namely the idea of that man’s spouse. Locke is keen to point out that much more of our thought involves relations than we might previously have thought. For example, when I think about Elizabeth II as the Queen of England my thinking actually involves relations, because I cannot truly think of Elizabeth as a queen without conceiving of her as having a certain relationship of sovereignty to some subjects (individual substances like David Beckham and J.K. Rowling). Locke then goes on to explore the role that relations have in our thinking about causation, space, time, morality, and (very famously) identity.

Throughout his discussion of the different kinds of complex ideas Locke is keen to emphasize that all of our ideas can ultimately be broken down into simple ideas received in sensation and reflection. Put differently, Locke is keenly aware that the success of his empiricist theory of mind depends on its ability to account for all the contents of our minds. Whether or not Locke is successful is a matter of dispute. On some occasions the analysis he gives of how a very complex idea could be constructed using only simple ideas is vague and requires the reader to fill in some gaps. And commentators have also suggested that some of the simple ideas Locke invokes, for example the simple ideas of power and unity, do not seem to be obvious components of our phenomenological experience.

Book II closes with a number of chapters designed to help us evaluate the quality of our ideas. Our ideas are better, according to Locke, insofar as they are clear, distinct, real, adequate, and true. Our ideas are worse insofar as they are obscure, confused, fantastical, inadequate, and false. Clarity and obscurity are explained via an analogy to vision. Clear ideas, like clear images, are crisp and fresh, not faded or diminished in the way that obscure ideas (or images) are. Distinction and confusion have to do with the individuation of ideas. Ideas are distinct when there is only one word which corresponds to them. Confused ideas are ones to which more than one word can correctly apply or ones that lack a clear and consistent correlation to one particular word. To use one of Locke’s examples, an idea of a leopard as a beast with spots would be confused. It is not distinct because the word “lynx” could apply to that idea just as easily as the word “leopard.” Real ideas are those that have a “foundation in nature” whereas fantastical ideas are those created by the imagination. For example, our idea of a horse would be a real idea and our idea of a unicorn would be fantastical. Adequacy and inadequacy have to do with how well ideas match the patterns according to which they were made. Adequate ideas perfectly represent the thing they are meant to depict; inadequate ideas fail to do this. Ideas are true when the mind understands them in a way that is correct according to linguistic practices and the way the world is structured. They are false when the mind misunderstands them along these lines.

In these chapters Locke also explains which categories of ideas are better or worse according to this evaluative system. Simple ideas do very well. Because objects directly produce them in the mind they tend to be clear, distinct, and so forth. Ideas of modes and relations also tend to do very well, but for a different reason. Locke thinks that the archetypes of these ideas are in the mind rather than in the world. As such, it is easy for these ideas to be good because the mind has a clear sense of what the ideas should be like as it constructs them. By contrast, ideas of substances tend to fare very poorly. The archetypes for these ideas are external world objects. Because our perceptual access to these objects is limited in a number of ways and because these objects are so intricate, ideas of substances tend to be confused, inadequate, false, and so forth.

d. Language

Book III of the Essay is concerned with language. Locke admits that this topic is something of a digression. He did not originally plan for language to take up an entire book of the Essay. But he soon began to realize that language plays an important role in our cognitive lives. Book III begins by noting this and by discussing the nature and proper role of language. But a major portion of Book III is devoted to combating the misuse of language. Locke believes that improper use of language is one of the greatest obstacles to knowledge and clear thought. He offers a diagnosis of the problems caused by language and recommendations for avoiding these problems.

Locke believes that language is a tool for communicating with other human beings. Specifically, Locke thinks that we want to communicate about our ideas, the contents of our minds. From here it is a short step to the view that: “Words in their primary or immediate Signification, stand for nothing, but the Ideas in the Mind of him that uses them.” (3.2.2, 405). When an agent utters the word “gold” she is referring to her idea of a shiny, yellowish, malleable substance of great value. When she utters the word “carrot” she is referring to her idea of a long, skinny, orange vegetable which grows underground. Locke is, of course, aware that the names we choose for these ideas are arbitrary and merely a matter of social convention.

Although the primary use of words is to refer to ideas in the mind of the speaker, Locke also allows that words make what he calls “secret reference” to two other things. First, humans also want their words to refer to the corresponding ideas in the minds of other humans. When Smith says “carrot” within earshot of Jones her hope is that Jones also has an idea of the long, skinny vegetable and that saying “carrot” will bring that idea into Jones’ mind. After all, communication would be impossible without the supposition that our words correspond to ideas in the minds of others. Second, humans suppose that their words stand for objects in the world. When Smith says “carrot” she wants to refer to more than just her idea, she also wants to refer to the long skinny objects themselves. But Locke is suspicious of these two other ways of understanding signification. He thinks the latter one, in particular, is illegitimate.

After discussing these basic features of language and reference Locke goes on to discuss specific cases of the relationship between ideas and words: words used for simple ideas, words used for modes, words used for substances, the way in which a single word can refer to a multiplicity of ideas, and so forth. There is also an interesting chapter on “particles.” These are words which do not refer to an idea but instead refer to a certain connection which holds between ideas. For example, if I say “Secretariat is brown” the word “Secretariat” refers to my idea of a certain racehorse, and “brown” refers to my idea of a certain color, but the word “is” does something different. That word is a particle and indicates that I am expressing something about the relationship between my ideas of Secretariat and brown and suggesting that they are connected in a certain way. Other particles includes words like “and”, “but”, “hence”, and so forth.

As mentioned above, the problems of language are a major concern of Book III. Locke thinks that language can lead to confusion and misunderstanding for a number of reasons. The signification of words is arbitrary, rather than natural, and this means it can be difficult to understand which words refer to which ideas. Many of our words stand for ideas which are complex, hard to acquire, or both. So many people will struggle to use those words appropriately. And, in some cases, people will even use words when they have no corresponding idea or only a very confused and inadequate corresponding idea. Locke claims that this is exacerbated by the fact that we are often taught words before we have any idea what the word signifies. A child, for example, might be taught the word “government” at a young age, but it will take her years to form a clear idea of what governments are and how they operate. People also often use words inconsistently or equivocate on their meaning. Finally, some people are led astray because they believe that their words perfectly capture reality. Recall from above that people secretly and incorrectly use their words to refer to objects in the external world. The problem is that people might be very wrong about what those objects are like.

Locke thinks that a result of all this is that people are seriously misusing language and that many debates and discussions in important fields like science, politics, and philosophy are confused or consist of merely verbal disputes. Locke provides a number of examples of language causing problems: Cartesians using “body” and “extension” interchangeably, even though the two ideas are distinct; physiologists who agree on all the facts yet have a long dispute because they have different understandings of the word “liquor”; Scholastic philosophers using the term “prime matter” when they are unable to actually frame an idea of such a thing, and so forth.

The remedies that Locke recommends for fixing these problems created by language are somewhat predictable. But Locke is quick to point out that while they sound like easy fixes they are actually quite difficult to implement. The first and most important step is to only use words when we have clear ideas attached to them. (Again, this sounds easy, but many of us might actually struggle to come up with a clear idea corresponding to even everyday terms like “glory” or “fascist”.) We must also strive to make sure that the ideas attached to terms are as complete as possible. We must strive to ensure that we use words consistently and do not equivocate; every time we utter a word we should use it to signify one and the same idea. Finally, we should communicate our definitions of words to others.

e. The Account of Knowledge

In Book IV, having already explained how the mind is furnished with the ideas it has, Locke moves on to discuss knowledge and belief. A good place to start is with a quote from the beginning of Book IV: “Knowledge then seems to me to be nothing but the perception of the connexion and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy of any of our Ideas. Where this Perception is, there is Knowledge, and where it is not, there, though we may fancy, guess, or believe, yet we always come short of Knowledge.” (4.2.2, 525). Locke spends the first part of Book IV clarifying and exploring this conception of knowledge. The second part focuses on how we should apportion belief in cases where we lack knowledge.

What does Locke mean by the “connection and agreement” and the “disagreement and repugnancy” of our ideas? Some examples might help. Bring to mind your idea of white and your idea of black. Locke thinks that upon doing this you will immediately perceive that they are different, they “disagree”. It is when you perceive this disagreement that you know the fact that white is not black. Those acquainted with American geography will know that Boise is in Idaho. On Locke’s account of knowledge, this means that they are able to perceive a certain connection that obtains between their idea of Idaho and their idea of Boise. Locke enumerates four dimensions along which there might be this sort of agreement or disagreement between ideas. First, we can perceive when two ideas are identical or non-identical. For example, knowing that sweetness is not bitterness consists in perceiving that the idea of sweetness is not identical to the idea of bitterness. Second, we can perceive relations that obtain between ideas. For example, knowing that 7 is greater than 3 consists in perceiving that there is a size relation of bigger and smaller between the two ideas. Third, we can perceive when our idea of a certain feature accompanies our idea of a certain thing. If I know that ice is cold this is because I perceive that my idea of cold always accompanies my idea of ice. Fourthly, we can perceive when existence agrees with any idea. I can have knowledge of this fourth kind when, for example, I perform the cogito and recognize the special relation between my idea of myself and my idea of existence. Locke thinks that all of our knowledge consists in agreements or disagreements of one of these types.

After detailing the types of relations between ideas which constitute knowledge Locke continues on to discuss three “degrees” of knowledge in 4.2. These degrees seem to consist in different ways of knowing something. The first degree Locke calls intuitive knowledge. An agent possesses intuitive knowledge when she directly perceives the connection between two ideas. This is the best kind of knowledge, as Locke says “Such kind of Truths, the Mind perceives at the first sight of the Ideas together, by bare Intuition, without the intervention of any other Idea; and this kind of knowledge is the clearest, and most certain, that humane Frailty is capable of.” (4.2.1, 531). The second degree of knowledge is called demonstrative. Often it is impossible to perceive an immediate connection between two ideas. For example, most of us are unable to tell that the three interior angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles simply by looking at them. But most of us, with the assistance of a mathematics teacher, can be made to see that they are equal by means of a geometric proof or demonstration. This is the model for demonstrative knowledge. Even if one is unable to directly perceive a relation between idea-X and idea-Y one might perceive a relation indirectly by means of idea-A and idea-B. This will be possible if the agent has intuitive knowledge of a connection between X and A, between A and B, and then between B and Y. Demonstrative knowledge consists, therefore, in a string of relations each of which is known intuitively.

The third degree of knowledge is called sensitive knowledge and has been the source of considerable debate and confusion among Locke commentators. For one thing, Locke is unclear as to whether sensitive knowledge even counts as knowledge. He writes that intuitive and demonstrative knowledge are, properly speaking, the only forms of knowledge, but that “There is, indeed, another Perception of the Mind…which going beyond bare probability, and yet not reaching perfectly to either of the foregoing degrees of certainty, passes under the name of Knowledge.” (4.2.14, 537). Sensitive knowledge has to do with the relationship between our ideas and the objects in the external world that produce them. Locke claims that we can be certain that when we perceive something, an orange, for example, there is an object in the external world which is responsible for these sensations. Part of Locke’s claim is that there is a serious qualitative difference between biting into an orange and remembering biting into an orange. There is something in the phenomenological experience of the former which assures us of a corresponding object in the external world.

Locke spends a fair amount of time in Book IV responding to worries that he is a skeptic or that his account of knowledge, with its emphasis on ideas, fails to be responsive to the external world. The general worry for Locke is fairly simple. By claiming that ideas are the only things humans have epistemic access to, and by claiming that knowledge relates only to our ideas, Locke seems to rule out the claim that we can ever know about the external world. Lockean agents are trapped behind a “veil of ideas.” Thus we cannot have any assurance that our ideas provide us with reliable information about the external world. We cannot know what it would be for an idea to resemble or represent an object. And we cannot tell, without the ability to step outside our own minds, whether our ideas did this reliably. This criticism has historically been thought to endanger Locke’s entire project. Gilbert Ryle’s memorable assessment is that “nearly every youthful student of philosophy both can and does in his second essay refute Locke’s entire Theory of Knowledge.” Recent scholarship has been much more charitable to Locke. But the central problem is still a pressing one.

Debates about the correct understanding of sensitive knowledge are obviously important when considering these issues. At first blush, the relation involved in sensitive knowledge seems to be a relation between an idea and a physical object in the world. But, if this reading is correct, then it becomes difficult to understand the many passages in which Locke insists that knowledge is a relation that holds only between ideas. Also relevant are debates about how to correctly understand Lockean ideas. Recall from above that although many understand ideas as mental objects, some understand them as mental acts. While most of the text seems to favor the first interpretation, it seems that the second interpretation has a significant advantage when responding to these skeptical worries. The reason is that the connection between ideas and external world objects is built right into the definition of an idea. An idea just is a perception of an external world object.

However the debates discussed in the previous paragraph are resolved, there is a consensus among commentators that Locke believes the scope of human understanding is very narrow. Humans are not capable of very much knowledge. Locke discusses this is 4.3, a chapter entitled “Extent of Humane Knowledge.” The fact that our knowledge is so limited should come as no surprise. We have already discussed the ways in which our ideas of substances are problematic. And we have just seen that we have no real understanding of the connection between our ideas and the objects that produce them.

The good news, however, is that while our knowledge might not be very extensive, it is sufficient for our needs. Locke’s memorable nautical metaphor holds that: “’Tis of great use to the Sailor to know the length of his Line, though he cannot with it fathom all the depths of the Ocean. ‘Tis well he knows, that it is long enough to reach the bottom, at such Places, as are necessary to direct his Voyage, and caution him against running upon Shoales, that may ruin him. Our Business here is not to know all things, but those which concern our Conduct.” (1.1.6, 46). Locke thinks we have enough knowledge to live comfortable lives on Earth, to realize that there is a God, to understand morality and behave appropriately, and to gain salvation. Our knowledge of morality, in particular, is very good. Locke even suggests that we might develop a demonstrable system of morality similar to Euclid’s demonstrable system of geometry. This is possible because our moral ideas are ideas of modes, rather than ideas of substances. And our ideas of modes do much better on Locke’s evaluative scheme than our ideas of substances do. Finally, while the limits to our knowledge might be disappointing, Locke notes that recognizing these limits is important and useful insofar as it will help us to better organize our intellectual inquiry. We will be saved from investigating questions which we could never know the answers to and can focus our efforts on areas where progress is possible.

One benefit of Locke’s somewhat bleak assessment of the scope of our knowledge was that it caused him to focus on an area which was underappreciated by many of his contemporaries. This was the arena of judgment or opinion, belief states which fall short of knowledge. Given that we have so little knowledge (that we can be certain of so little) the realm of probability becomes very important. Recall that knowledge consists in a perceived agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Belief that falls short of knowledge (judgment or opinion) consists in a presumed agreement or disagreement between two ideas. Consider an example: I am not entirely sure who the Prime Minister of Canada is, but I am somewhat confident it is Stephen Harper. Locke’s claim is that in judging that the Canadian PM is Stephen Harper I am acting as though a relation holds between the two ideas. I do not directly perceive a connection between my idea of Stephen Harper and my idea of the Canadian PM, but I presume that one exists.

After offering this account of what judgment is, Locke offers an analysis of how and why we form the opinions we do and offers some recommendations for forming our opinions responsibly. This includes a diagnosis of the errors people make in judging, a discussion of the different degrees of assent, and an interesting discussion of the epistemic value of testimony.

3. Special Topics in the Essay

As discussed above, the main project of the Essay is an examination of the human understanding and an analysis of knowledge. But the Essay is a rather expansive work and contains discussion of many other topics of philosophical interest. Some of these will be discussed below. A word of warning, however, is required before proceeding. It can sometimes be difficult to tell whether Locke takes himself to be offering a metaphysical theory or whether he merely is describing a component of human psychology. For example, we might question whether his account of personal identity is meant to give necessary and sufficient conditions for a metaphysical account of personhood or whether it is merely designed to tell us what sorts of identity attributions we do and should make and why. We may further question whether, when discussing primary and secondary qualities, Locke is offering a theory about how perception really works or whether this discussion is a mere digression used to illustrate a point about the nature of our ideas. So while many of these topics have received a great deal of attention, their precise relationship to the main project of the Essay can be difficult to locate.

a. Primary and Secondary Qualities

Book 2, Chapter 8 of the Essay contains an extended discussion of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Locke was hardly original in making this distinction. By the time the Essay was published, it had been made by many others and was even somewhat commonplace. That said, Locke’s formulation of the distinction and his analysis of the related issues has been tremendously influential and has provided the framework for much of the subsequent discussion on the topic.

Locke defines a quality as a power that a body has to produce ideas in us. So a simple object like a baked potato which can produce ideas of brownness, heat, ovular shape, solidity, and determinate size must have a series of corresponding qualities. There must be something in the potato which gives us the idea of brown, something in the potato which gives us the idea of ovular shape, and so on. The primary/secondary quality distinction claims that some of these qualities are very different from others.

Locke motivates the distinction between two types of qualities by discussing how a body could produce an idea in us. The theory of perception endorsed by Locke is highly mechanical. All perception occurs as a result of motion and collision. If I smell the baked potato, there must be small material particles which are flying off of the potato and bumping into nerves in my nose, the motion in the nose-nerves causes a chain reaction along my nervous system until eventually there is some motion in my brain and I experience the idea of a certain smell. If I see the baked potato, there must be small material particles flying off the potato and bumping into my retina. That bumping causes a similar chain reaction which ends in my experience of a certain roundish shape.

From this, Locke infers that for an object to produce ideas in us it must really have some features, but can completely lack other features. This mechanical theory of perception requires that objects producing ideas in us have shape, extension, mobility, and solidity. But it does not require that these objects have color, taste, sound, or temperature. So the primary qualities are qualities actually possessed by bodies. These are features that a body cannot be without. The secondary qualities, by contrast, are not really had by bodies. They are just ways of talking about the ideas that can be produced in us by bodies in virtue of their primary qualities. So when we claim that the baked potato is solid, this means that solidity is one of its fundamental features. But when I claim that it smells a certain earthy kind of way, this just means that its fundamental features are capable of producing the idea of the earthy smell in my mind.

These claims lead to Locke’s claims about resemblance: “From whence I think it is easie to draw this Observation, That the Ideas of primary Qualities of Bodies, are Resemblances of them, and their Patterns do really exist in the Bodies themselves; but the Ideas, produced in us by these Secondary Qualities, have no resemblance of them at all.” (2.8.14, 137). Insofar as my idea of the potato is of something solid, extended, mobile, and possessing a certain shape my idea accurately captures something about the real nature of the potato. But insofar as my idea of the potato is of something with a particular smell, temperature, and taste my ideas do not accurately capture mind-independent facts about the potato.

b. Mechanism

Around the time of the Essay the mechanical philosophy was emerging as the predominant theory about the physical world. The mechanical philosophy held that the fundamental entities in the physical world were small individual bodies called corpuscles. Each corpuscle was solid, extended, and had a certain shape. These corpuscles could combine together to form ordinary objects like rocks, tables, and plants. The mechanical philosophy argued that all features of bodies and all natural phenomena could be explained by appeal to these corpuscles and their basic properties (in particular, size, shape, and motion).

Locke was exposed to the mechanical philosophy while at Oxford and became acquainted with the writings of its most prominent advocates. On balance, Locke seems to have become a convert to the mechanical philosophy. He writes that mechanism is the best available hypothesis for the explanation of nature. We have already seen some of the explanatory work done by mechanism in the Essay. The distinction between primary and secondary qualities was a hallmark of the mechanical philosophy and neatly dovetailed with mechanist accounts of perception. Locke reaffirms his commitment to this account of perception at a number of other points in the Essay. And when discussing material objects Locke is very often happy to allow that they are composed of material corpuscles. What is peculiar, however, is that while the Essay does seem to have a number of passages in which Locke supports mechanical explanations and speaks highly of mechanism, it also contains some highly critical remarks about mechanism and discussions of the limits of the mechanical philosophy.

Locke’s critiques of mechanism can be divided into two strands. First, he recognized that there were a number of observed phenomena which mechanism struggled to explain. Mechanism did offer neat explanations of some observed phenomena. For example, the fact that objects could be seen but not smelled through glass could be explained by positing that the corpuscles which interacted with our retinas were smaller than the ones which interacted with our nostrils. So the sight corpuscles could pass through the spaces between the glass corpuscles, but the smell corpuscles would be turned away. But other phenomena were harder to explain. Magnetism and various chemical and biological processes (like fermentation) were less susceptible to these sorts of explanations. And universal gravitation, which Locke took Newton to have proved the existence of in the Principia, was particularly hard to explain. Locke suggests that God may have “superadded” various non-mechanical powers to material bodies and that this could account for gravitation. (Indeed, at several points he even suggests that God may have superadded the power of thought to matter and that humans might be purely material beings.)

Locke’s second set of critiques pertain to theoretical problems in the mechanical philosophy. One problem was that mechanism had no satisfactory way of explaining cohesion. Why do corpuscles sometimes stick together? If things like tables and chairs are just collections of small corpuscles then they should be very easy to break apart, the same way I can easily separate one group of marbles from another. Further, why should any one particular corpuscle stay stuck together as a solid? What accounts for its cohesion? Again, mechanism seems hard-pressed to offer an answer. Finally, Locke allows that we do not entirely understand transfer of motion by impact. When one corpuscle collides with another we actually do not have a very satisfying explanation for why the second moves away under the force of the impact.

Locke presses these critiques with some skill and in a serious manner. Still, ultimately he is guardedly optimistic about mechanism. This somewhat mixed attitude on Locke’s part has led commentators to debate questions about his exact attitude toward the mechanical philosophy and his motivations for discussing it.

c. Volition and Agency

In Book 2, Chapter 21 of the Essay Locke explores the topic of the will. One of the things which separates people from rocks and billiard balls is our ability to make decisions and control our actions. We feel that we are free in certain respects and that we have the power to choose certain thoughts and actions. Locke calls this power the will. But there are tricky questions about what this power consists in and about what it takes to freely (or voluntarily) choose something. 2.21 contains a delicate and sustained discussion of these tricky questions.

Locke first begins with questions of freedom and then proceeds to a discussion of the will. On Locke’s analysis, we are free to do those things which we both will to do and are physically capable of doing. For example, if I wish to jump into a lake and have no physical maladies which prevent it, then I am free to jump into the lake. By contrast, if I do not wish to jump into the lake, but a friend pushes me in, I did not act freely when I entered the water. Or, if I wish to jump into the lake, but have a spinal injury and cannot move my body, then I do not act freely when I stay on the shore. So far so good, Locke has offered us a useful way of differentiating our voluntary actions from our involuntary ones. But there is still a pressing question about freedom and the will: that of whether the will is itself free. When I am deciding whether or not to jump into the water, is the will determined by outside factors to choose one or the other? Or can it, so to speak, make up its own mind and choose either option?

Locke’s initial position in the chapter is that the will is determined. But in later sections he offers a qualification of sorts. In normal circumstances, the will is determined by what Locke calls uneasiness: “What is it that determines the Will in regard to our Actions? … some (and for the most part the most pressing) uneasiness a Man is at present under. That is that which successively determines the Will, and sets us upon those Actions, we perform.” (2.21.31, 250-1). The uneasiness is caused by the absence of something that is perceived as good. The perception of the thing as good gives rise to a desire for that thing. Suppose I choose to eat a slice of pizza. Locke would say I must have made this choice because the absence of the pizza was troubling me somehow (I was feeling hunger pains, or longing for something savory) and this discomfort gave rise to a desire for food. That desire in turn determined my will to choose to eat pizza.

Locke’s qualification to this account of the will being determined by uneasiness has to do with what he calls suspension. Beginning with the second edition of the Essay, Locke began to argue that the most pressing desire for the most part determines the will, but not always: “For the mind having in most cases, as is evident in Experience, a power to suspend the execution and satisfaction of any of its desires, and so all, one after another, is at liberty to consider the objects of them; examine them on all sides, and weigh them with others.” (2.21.47, 263). So even if, at this moment, my desire for pizza is the strongest desire, Locke thinks I can pause before I decide to eat the pizza and consider the decision. I can consider other items in my desire set: my desire to lose weight, or to leave the pizza for my friend, or to keep a vegan diet. Careful consideration of these other possibilities might have the effect of changing my desire set. If I really focus on how important it is to stay fit and healthy by eating nutritious foods then my desire to leave the pizza might become stronger than my desire to eat it and my will may be determined to choose to not eat the pizza. But of course we can always ask whether a person has a choice whether or not to suspend judgment or whether the suspension of judgment is itself determined by the mind’s strongest desire. On this point Locke is somewhat vague. While most interpreters think our desires determine when judgment is suspended, some others disagree and argue that suspension of judgment offers Lockean agents a robust form of free will.

d. Personhood and Personal Identity

Locke was one of the first philosophers to give serious attention to the question of personal identity. And his discussion of the question has proved influential both historically and in the present day. The discussion occurs in the midst of Locke’ larger discussion of the identity conditions for various entities in Book II, Chapter 27. At heart, the question is simple, what makes me the same person as the person who did certain things in the past and that will do certain things in the future? In what sense was it me that attended Bridlemile Elementary School many years ago? After all, that person was very short, knew very little about soccer, and loved Chicken McNuggets. I, on the other hand, am average height, know tons of soccer trivia, and get rather queasy at the thought of eating chicken, especially in nugget form. Nevertheless, it is true that I am identical to the boy who attended Bridlemile.

In Locke’s time, the topic of personal identity was important for religious reasons. Christian doctrine held that there was an afterlife in which virtuous people would be rewarded in heaven and sinful people would be punished in hell. This scheme provided motivation for individuals to behave morally. But, for this to work, it was important that the person who is rewarded or punished is the same person as the one who lived virtuously or lived sinfully. And this had to be true even though the person being rewarded or punished had died, had somehow continued to exist in an afterlife, and had somehow managed to be reunited with a body. So it was important to get the issue of personal identity right.

Locke’s views on personal identity involve a negative project and a positive project. The negative project involves arguing against the view that personal identity consists in or requires the continued existence of a particular substance. And the positive project involves defending the view that personal identity consists in continuity of consciousness. We can begin with this positive view. Locke defines a person as “a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places; which it does only by that consciousness, which is inseparable from thinking, and as it seems to me essential to it.” (2.27.9, 335).  Locke suggests here that part of what makes a person the same through time is their ability to recognize past experiences as belonging to them. For me, part of what differentiates one little boy who attended Bridlemile Elementary from all the other children who went there is my realization that I share in his consciousness. Put differently, my access to his lived experience at Bridlemile is very different from my access to the lived experiences of others there: it is first-personal and immediate. I recognize his experiences there as part of a string of experiences that make up my life and join up to my current self and current experiences in a unified way. That is what makes him the same person as me.

Locke believes that this account of personal identity as continuity of consciousness obviates the need for an account of personal identity given in terms of substances. A traditional view held that there was a metaphysical entity, the soul, which guaranteed personal identity through time; wherever there was the same soul, the same person would be there as well. Locke offers a number of thought experiments to cast doubt on this belief and show that his account is superior. For example, if a soul was wiped clean of all its previous experiences and given new ones (as might be the case if reincarnation were true), the same soul would not justify the claim that all of those who had had it were the same person. Or, we could imagine two souls who had their conscious experiences completely swapped. In this case, we would want to say that the person went with the conscious experiences and did not remain with the soul.

Locke’s account of personal identity seems to be a deliberate attempt to move away from some of the metaphysical alternatives and to offer an account which would be acceptable to individuals from a number of different theological backgrounds. Of course, a number of serious challenges have been raised for Locke’s account.. Most of these focus on the crucial role seemingly played by memory. And the precise details of Locke’s positive proposal in 2.27 have been hard to pin down. Nevertheless, many contemporary philosophers believe that there is an important kernel of truth in Locke’s analysis.

e. Real and Nominal Essences

Locke’s distinction between the real essence of a substance and the nominal essence of a substance is one of the most fascinating components of the Essay. Scholastic philosophers had held that the main goal of metaphysics and science was to learn about the essences of things: the key metaphysical components of things which explained all of their interesting features. Locke thought this project was misguided. That sort of knowledge, knowledge of the real essences of beings, was unavailable to human beings. This led Locke to suggest an alternative way to understand and investigate nature; he recommends focusing on the nominal essences of things.

When Locke introduces the term real essence he uses it to refer to the “real constitution of any Thing, which is the foundation of all those Properties, that are combined in, and are constantly found to co-exist with [an object]” (3.6.6, 442). For the Scholastics this real essence would be an object’s substantial form. For proponents of the mechanical philosophy it would be the number and arrangement of the material corpuscles which composed the body. Locke sometimes endorses this latter understanding of real essence. But he insists that these real essences are entirely unknown and undiscoverable by us. The nominal essences, by contrast, are known and are the best way we have to understand individual substances. Nominal essences are just collections of all the observed features an individual thing has. So the nominal essence of a piece of gold would include the ideas of yellowness, a certain weight, malleability, dissolvability in certain chemicals, and so on.

Locke offers us a helpful analogy to illustrate the difference between real and nominal essences. He suggests that our position with respect to ordinary objects is like the position of someone looking at a very complicated clock. The gears, wheels, weights, and pendulum that produce the motions of the hands on the clock face (the clock’s real essence) are unknown to the person. They are hidden behind the casing. He or she can only know about the observable features like the clock’s shape, the movement of the hands, and the chiming of the hours (the clock’s nominal essence). Similarly, when I look at an object like a dandelion, I am only able to observe its nominal essence (the yellow color, the bitter smell, and so forth). I have no clear idea what produces these features of the dandelion or how they are produced.

Locke’s views on real and nominal essences have important consequences for his views about the division of objects into groups and sorts. Why do we consider some things to be zebras and other things to be rabbits? Locke’s view is that we group according to nominal essence, not according to (unknown) real essence. But this has the consequence that our groupings might fail to adequately reflect whatever real distinctions there might be in nature. So Locke is not a realist about species or types. Instead, he is a conventionalist. We project these divisions on the world when we choose to classify objects as falling under the various nominal essences we’ve created.

f. Religious Epistemology

The epistemology of religion (claims about our understanding of God and our duties with respect to him) were tremendously contentious during Locke’s lifetime. The English Civil War, fought during Locke’s youth, was in large part a disagreement over the right way to understand the Christian religion and the requirements of religious faith. Throughout the seventeenth century, a number of fundamentalist Christian sects continually threatened the stability of English political life. And the status of Catholic and Jewish people in England was a vexed one.

So the stakes were very high when, in 4.18, Locke discussed the nature of faith and reason and their respective domains. He defines reason as an attempt to discover certainty or probability through the use of our natural faculties in the investigation of the world. Faith, by contrast, is certainty or probability attained through a communication believed to have come, originally, from God. So when Smith eats a potato chip and comes to believe it is salty, she believes this according to reason. But when Smith believes that Joshua made the sun stand still in the sky because she read it in the Bible (which she takes to be divine revelation), she believes according to faith.

Although it initially sounds as though Locke has carved out quite separate roles for faith and reason, it must be noted that these definitions make faith subordinate to reason in a subtle way. For, as Locke explains: “Whatever GOD hath revealed, is certainly true; no Doubt can be made of it. This is the proper Object of Faith: But whether it be a divine Revelation, or no, Reason must judge; which can never permit the Mind to reject a greater Evidence to embrace what is less evident, nor allow it to entertain Probability in opposition to Knowledge and Certainty.” (4.18.10, 695). First, Locke thinks that if any proposition, even one which purports to be divinely revealed, clashes with the clear evidence of reason then it should not be believed. So, even if it seems like God is telling us that 1+1=3, Locke claims we should go on believing that 1+1=2 and we should deny that the 1+1=3 revelation was genuine. Second, Locke thinks that to determine whether or not something is divinely revealed we have to exercise our reason. How can we tell whether the Bible contains God’s direct revelation conveyed through the inspired Biblical authors or whether it is instead the work of mere humans? Only reason can help us settle that question. Locke thinks that those who ignore the importance of reason in determining what is and is not a matter of faith are guilty of “enthusiasm.” And in a chapter added to later editions of the Essay Locke sternly warns his readers against the serious dangers posed by this intellectual vice.

In all of this Locke emerges as a strong moderate. He himself was deeply religious and took religious faith to be important. But he also felt that there were serious limits to what could be justified through appeals to faith. The issues discussed in this section will be very important below where Locke’s views on the importance of religious toleration are discussed.

4. Political Philosophy

Locke lived during a very eventful time in English politics. The Civil War, Interregnum, Restoration, Exclusion Crisis, and Glorious Revolution all happened during his lifetime. For much of his life Locke held administrative positions in government and paid very careful attention to contemporary debates in political theory. So it is perhaps unsurprising that he wrote a number of works on political issues. In this field, Locke is best known for his arguments in favor of religious toleration and limited government. Today these ideas are commonplace and widely accepted. But in Locke’s time they were highly innovative, even radical.

a. The Two Treatises

Locke’s Two Treatises of Government were published in 1689. It was originally thought that they were intended to defend the Glorious Revolution and William’s seizure of the throne. We now know, however, that they were in fact composed much earlier. Nonetheless, they do lay out a view of government amenable to many of William’s supporters.

The First Treatise is now of primarily historical interest. It takes the form of a detailed critique of a work called Patriacha by Robert Filmer. Filmer had argued, in a rather unsophisticated way, in favor of divine right monarchy. On his view, the power of kings ultimately originated in the dominion which God gave to Adam and which had passed down in an unbroken chain through the ages. Locke disputes this picture on a number of historical grounds. Perhaps more importantly, Locke also distinguishes between a number of different types of dominion or governing power which Filmer had run together.

After clearing some ground in the First Treatise, Locke offers a positive view of the nature of government in the much better known Second Treatise. Part of Locke’s strategy in this work was to offer a different account of the origins of government. While Filmer had suggested that humans had always been subject to political power, Locke argues for the opposite. According to him, humans were initially in a state of nature. The state of nature was apolitical in the sense that there were no governments and each individual retained all of his or her natural rights. People possessed these natural rights (including the right to attempt to preserve one’s life, to seize unclaimed valuables, and so forth) because they were given by God to all of his people.

The state of nature was inherently unstable. Individuals would be under contrast threat of physical harm. And they would be unable to pursue any goals that required stability and widespread cooperation with other humans. Locke’s claim is that government arose in this context. Individuals, seeing the benefits which could be gained, decided to relinquish some of their rights to a central authority while retaining other rights. This took the form of a contract. In agreement for relinquishing certain rights, individuals would receive protection from physical harm, security for their possessions, and the ability to interact and cooperate with other humans in a stable environment.

So, according to this view, governments were instituted by the citizens of those governments. This has a number of very important consequences. On this view, rulers have an obligation to be responsive to the needs and desires of these citizens. Further, in establishing a government the citizens had relinquished some, but not all of their original rights. So no ruler could claim absolute power over all elements of a citizen’s life. This carved out important room for certain individual rights or liberties. Finally, and perhaps most importantly, a government which failed to adequately protect the rights and interests of its citizens or a government which attempted to overstep its authority would be failing to perform the task for which it was created. As such, the citizens would be entitled to revolt and replace the existing government with one which would suitably carry out the duties of ensuring peace and civil order while respecting individual rights.

So Locke was able to use the account of natural rights and a government created through contract to accomplish a number of important tasks. He could use it to show why individuals retain certain rights even when they are subject to a government. He could use it to show why despotic governments which attempted to unduly infringe on the rights of their citizens were bad. And he could use it to show that citizens had a right to revolt in instances where governments failed in certain ways. These are powerful ideas which remain important even today.

For more. see the article Political Philosophy.

b. Property

Locke’s Second Treatise on government contains an influential account of the nature of private property. According to Locke, God gave humans the world and its contents to have in common. The world was to provide humans with what was necessary for the continuation and enjoyment of life. But Locke also believed it was possible for individuals to appropriate individual parts of the world and justly hold them for their own exclusive use. Put differently, Locke believed that we have a right to acquire private property.

Locke’s claim is that we acquire property by mixing our labor with some natural resource. For example, if I discover some grapes growing on a vine, through my labor in picking and collecting these grapes I acquire an ownership right over them. If I find an empty field and then use my labor to plow the field then plant and raise crops, I will be the proper owner of those crops. If I chop down trees in an unclaimed forest and use the wood to fashion a table, then that table will be mine. Locke places two important limitations on the way in which property can be acquired by mixing one’s labor with natural resources. First, there is what has come to be known as the Waste Proviso. One must not take so much property that some of it goes to waste. I should not appropriate gallons and gallons of grapes if I am only able to eat a few and the rest end up rotting. If the goods of the Earth were given to us by God, it would be inappropriate to allow some of this gift to go to waste. Second, there is the Enough-And-As-Good Proviso. This says that in appropriating resources I am required to leave enough and as good for others to appropriate. If the world was left to us in common by God, it would be wrong of me to appropriate more than my fair share and fail to leave sufficient resources for others.

After currency is introduced and after governments are established the nature of property obviously changes a great deal. Using metal, which can be made into coins and which does not perish the way foodstuffs and other goods do, individuals are able to accumulate much more wealth than would be possible otherwise. So the proviso concerning waste seems to drop away. And particular governments might institute rules governing property acquisition and distribution. Locke was aware of this and devoted a great deal of thought to the nature of property and the proper distribution of property within a commonwealth. His writings on economics, monetary policy, charity, and social welfare systems are evidence of this. But Locke’s views on property inside of a commonwealth have received far less attention than his views on the original acquisition of property in the state of nature.

c. Toleration

Locke had been systematically thinking about issues relating to religious toleration since his early years in London and even though he only published his Epistola de Tolerantia (A Letter Concerning Toleration) in 1689 he had finished writing it several years before. The question of whether or not a state should attempt to prescribe one particular religion within the state, what means states might use to do so, and what the correct attitude should be toward those who resist conversion to the official state religion had been central to European politics ever since the Protestant Reformation. Locke’s time in England, France, and the Netherlands had given him experiences of three very different approaches to these questions. These experiences had convinced him that, for the most part, individuals should be allowed to practice their religion without interference from the state. Indeed, part of the impetus for the publication of Locke’s Letter Concerning Toleration came from Louis XIV’s revocation of the Edict of Nantes, which took away the already limited rights of Protestants in France and exposed them to state persecution.

It is possible to see Locke’s arguments in favor of toleration as relating both to the epistemological views of the Essay and the political views of the Two Treatises. Relating to Locke’s epistemological views, recall from above that Locke thought the scope of human knowledge was extremely restricted. We might not be particularly good at determining what the correct religion is. There is no reason to think that those holding political power will be any better at discovering the true religion than anyone else, so they should not attempt to enforce their views on others. Instead, each individual should be allowed to pursue true beliefs as best as they are able. Little harm results from allowing others to have their own religious beliefs.  Indeed, it might be beneficial to allow a plurality of beliefs because one group might end up with the correct beliefs and win others over to their side.

Relating to Locke’s political views, as expressed in the Two Treatises, Locke endorses toleration on the grounds that the enforcement of religious conformity is outside the proper scope of government. People consent to governments for the purpose of establishing social order and the rule of law. Governments should refrain from enforcing religious conformity because doing so is unnecessary and irrelevant for these ends. Indeed, attempting to enforce conformity may positively harm these ends as it will likely lead to resistance from members of prohibited religions. Locke also suggests that governments should tolerate the religious beliefs of individual citizens because enforcing religious belief is actually impossible. Acceptance of a certain religion is an inward act, a function of one’s beliefs. But governments are designed to control people’s actions. So governments are, in many ways, ill-equipped to enforce the adoption of a particular religion because individual people have an almost perfect control of their own thoughts.

While Locke’s views on toleration were very progressive for the time and while his views do have an affinity with our contemporary consensus on the value of religious toleration it is important to recognize that Locke did place some severe limits on toleration. He did not think that we should tolerate the intolerant, those who would seek to forcibly impose their religious views on others. Similarly, any religious group who posed a threat to political stability or public safety should not be tolerated. Importantly, Locke included Roman Catholics in this group. On his view, Catholics had a fundamental allegiance to the Pope, a foreign prince who did not recognize the sovereignty of English law. This made Catholics a threat to civil government and peace. Finally, Locke also believed that atheists should not be tolerated. Because they did not believe they would be rewarded or punished for their actions in an afterlife, Locke did not think they could be trusted to behave morally or maintain their contractual obligations.

5. Theology

We have already seen that in the Essay Locke developed an account of belief according to faith and belief according to reason. Recall that an agent believes according to reason when she discovers something through the use of her natural faculties and she believes according to faith when she takes something as truth because she understands it to be a message from God. Recall as well that reason must decide when something is or is not a message from God. The goal of Locke’s The Reasonableness of Christianity is to show that it is reasonable to be a Christian. Locke argues that we do have sufficient reason to think that the central truths of Christianity were communicated to us by God through his messenger, Jesus of Nazareth.

For Locke’s project to succeed he needed to show that Jesus provided his original followers with sufficient evidence that he was a legitimate messenger from God. Given that numerous individuals in history had purported to be the recipients of divine revelation, there must be something special which set Jesus apart. Locke offers two considerations in this regard. The first is that Jesus fulfilled a number of historical predictions concerning the coming of a Messiah. The second is that Jesus performed a number of miracles which attest that he had a special relationship to God. Locke also claims that we have sufficient reason to believe that these miracles actually occurred on the basis of testimony from those who witnessed them first-hand and a reliable chain of reporting from Jesus’ time into our own. This argument leads Locke into a discussion of the types and value of testimony which many philosophers have found to be interesting in its own right.

One striking feature of The Reasonableness of Christianity is the requirement for salvation that Locke endorses. Disputes about which precise beliefs were necessary for salvation and eternal life in Heaven were at the core of much religious disagreement in Locke’s time. Different denominations and sects claimed that they, and often only they, had the correct beliefs. Locke, by contrast, argued that to be a true Christian and worthy of salvation an individual only need to believe one simple truth: that Jesus is the Messiah. Of course, Locke believed there were many other important truths in the Bible. But he thought these other truths, especially those contained in the Epistles rather than the Gospels, could be difficult to interpret and could lead to disputes and disagreement. The core tenet of Christianity, however, that Jesus is the Messiah, was a mandatory belief.

In making the requirements for Christian faith and salvation so minimal Locke was part of a growing faction in the Church of England. These individuals, often known as latitudinarians, were deliberately attempting to construct a more irenic Christianity with the goal of avoiding the conflict and controversy that previous internecine fights had produced. So Locke was hardly alone in attempting to find a set of core Christian commitments which were free of sectarian theological baggage. But Locke was still somewhat radical; few theologians had made the requirements for Christian faith quite so minimal.

6. Education

Locke was regarded by many in his time as an expert on educational matters. He taught many students at Oxford and also served as a private tutor. Locke’s correspondence shows that he was constantly asked to recommend tutors and offer pedagogical advice. Locke’s expertise led to his most important work on the subject: Some Thoughts Concerning Education. The work had its origins in a series of letters Locke wrote to Edward Clarke offering advice on the education of Clarke’s children and was first published in 1693.

Locke’s views on education were, for the time, quite forward-looking. Classical languages, usually learned through tedious exercises involving rote memorization, and corporeal punishment were two predominant features of the seventeenth century English educational system. Locke saw little use for either. Instead, he emphasized the importance of teaching practical knowledge. He recognized that children learn best when they are engaged with the subject matter. Locke also foreshadowed some contemporary pedagogical views by suggesting that children should be allowed some self-direction in their course of study and should have the ability to pursue their interests.

Locke believed it was important to take great care in educating the young. He recognized that habits and prejudices formed in youth could be very hard to break in later life. Thus, much of Some Thoughts Concerning Education focuses on morality and the best ways to inculcate virtue and industry. Locke rejected authoritarian approaches. Instead, he favored methods that would help children to understand the difference between right and wrong and to cultivate a moral sense of their own.

7. Locke’s Influence

The Essay was quickly recognized as an important philosophical contribution both by its admirers and by its critics. Before long it had been incorporated into the curriculum at Oxford and Cambridge and its translation into both Latin and French garnered it an audience on the Continent as well. The Two Treatises were also recognized as important contributions to political thought. While the work had some success in England among those favorably disposed to the Glorious Revolution, its primary impact was abroad. During the American Revolution (and to a lesser extent, during the French Revolution) Locke’s views were often appealed to by those seeking to establish more representative forms of government.

Related to this last point, Locke came to be seen, alongside his friend Newton, as an embodiment of Enlightenment values and ideals. Newtonian science would lay bare the workings of nature and lead to important technological advances. Lockean philosophy would lay bare the workings of men’s minds and lead to important reforms in law and government. Voltaire played an instrumental role in shaping this legacy for Locke and worked hard to publicize Locke’s views on reason, toleration, and limited government. Locke also came to be seen as an inspiration for the Deist movement. Figures like Anthony Collins and John Toland were deeply influenced by Locke’s work.

Locke is often recognized as the founder of British Empiricism and it is true that Locke laid the foundation for much of English-language philosophy in the 18th and early 19th centuries. But those who followed in his footsteps were not unquestioning followers. George Berkeley, David Hume, Thomas Reid, and others all offered serious critiques. In recent decades, readers have attempted to offer more charitable reconstructions of Locke’s philosophy. Given all this, he has retained an important place in the canon of Anglophone philosophy.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Locke’s Works

  • Laslett, P. [ed.] 1988. Two Treatises of Government. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Locke, J. 1823. The Works of John Locke. London: Printed for T. Tegg (10 volumes).
  • Locke, J. The Clarendon Edition of the Works of John Locke, Oxford University Press, 2015. This edition includes the following volumes:
  • Nidditch, P. [ed.] 1975. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Nidditch, P. and G.A.J. Rogers [eds.] 1990. Drafts for the Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Yolton, J.W. and J.S. Yolton. [eds.] 1989. Some Thoughts Concerning Education.
  • Higgins-Biddle, J.C. [ed.] 1999. The Reasonableness of Christianity.
  • Milton, J.R. and P. Milton. [eds.] 2006. An Essay Concerning Toleration.
  • de Beer, E.S. [ed.] 1976-1989. The Correspondence of John Locke. (8 volumes).
  • von Leyden, W. [ed.] 1954. Essays on the Law of Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

b. Recommended Reading

The following are recommendations for further reading on Locke. Each work has a brief statement indicating the contents

  • Anstey, P. 2011. John Locke & Natural Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • A thorough examination of Locke’s scientific and medical thinking.
  • Ayers, M.  1993. Locke: Epistemology and Ontology. New York: Routledge.
  • A classic in Locke studies. Explores philosophical topics in the Essay and discusses Locke’s project as a whole. One volume on epistemology and one on metaphysics.
  • Chappell, V. 1994. The Cambridge Companion to Locke. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on all aspects of Locke’s thought.
  • LoLordo, A. 2012. Locke’s Moral Man. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An exploration and discussion of themes at the intersection of Locke’s moral and political thought. Focuses particularly on agency, personhood, and rationality.
  • Lowe, E.J. 2005. Locke. New York: Routledge.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1976. Problems from Locke.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Uses Locke’s work to raise and discuss a number of philosophical issues and puzzles.
  • Newman, L. 2007. The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • A series of essays focusing on specific issues in Locke’s Essay.
  • Pyle, A.J. 2013. Locke. London: Polity.
  • An excellent and brief introduction to Locke’s thought and historical context. A very good place to start for beginners.
  • Rickless, S. 2014. Locke. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • An introductory overview of Locke’s philosophical and political thought.
  • Stuart, M. 2013. Locke’s Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • An in-depth treatment of metaphysical issues and problems in the Essay.
  • Waldron, J. 2002. God, Locke, and Equality: Christian Foundation of Locke’s Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • An examination of some key issues in Locke’s political thought.
  • Woolhouse, R. 2009. Locke: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • The best and most recent biography of Locke’s life.


Author Information

Patrick J. Connolly
Iowa State University
U. S. A.

Leibniz: Logic

LeibnizThe revolutionary ideas of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) on logic were developed by him between 1670 and 1690. The ideas can be divided into four areas: the Syllogism, the Universal Calculus, Propositional Logic, and Modal Logic.

These revolutionary ideas remained hidden in the Archive of the Royal Library in Hanover until 1903 when the French mathematician Louis Couturat published the Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz. Couturat was a great admirer of Leibniz’s thinking in general, and he saw in Leibniz a brilliant forerunner of modern logic. Nevertheless he came to the conclusion that Leibniz’s logic had largely failed and that in general the so-called “intensional” approach to logic was necessarily bound to fail. Similarly, in their standard historiography of logic, W. & M. Kneale (1962) maintained that Leibniz “never succeeded in producing a calculus which covered even the whole theory of the syllogism”. Even in recent years, scholars like Liske (1994), Swoyer (1995), and Schupp (2000) argued that Leibniz’s intensional conception must give rise to inconsistencies and paradoxes.

On the other hand, starting with Dürr (1930), Rescher (1954), and Kauppi (1960), a certain rehabilitation of Leibniz’s intensional logic may be observed which was by and by supported and supplemented by Poser (1969), Ishiguro (1972), Rescher (1979), Burkhardt (1980), Schupp (1982), and Mugnai (1992). However, the full wealth of Leibniz’s logical ideas became visible only in Lenzen (1990), (2004a), and (2004b), where the many pieces and fragments were joined together to an impressive system of four calculi:

  • The algebra of concepts L1 (which turns out to be deductively equivalent to the Boolean algebra of sets)
  • The quantificational system L2 (where “indefinite concepts” function as quantifiers ranging over concepts)
  • A propositional calculus of strict implication (obtained from L1 by the strict analogy between the containment-relation among concepts and the inference-relation among propositions)
  • The so-called “Plus-Minus-Calculus” (which is to be viewed as a theory of set-theoretical containment, “addition,” and “subtraction”).

Table of Contents

  1. Leibniz’s Logical Works
  2. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism
    1. Axiomatization of the Theory of the Syllogism
    2. The Semantics of “Characteristic Numbers”
    3. Linear Diagrams and Euler-circles
  3. Works on the Universal Calculus
    1. The Algebra of Concepts L1
    2. The Quantificational System L2
    3. The Plus-Minus-Calculus
  4. Leibniz’s Calculus of Strict Implication
  5. Works on Modal Logic
    1. Possible-Worlds-Semantics for Alethic Modalities
    2. Basic Principles of Deontic Logic
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Abbreviations for Leibniz’s works
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Leibniz’s Logical Works

Throughout his life (beginning in 1646 in Leipzig and ending in 1716 in Hanover), Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz did not publish a single paper on logic, except perhaps for the mathematical dissertation “De Arte Combinatoria” and the juridical disputa­tion “De Conditionibus” (GP 4, 27-104 and AE IV, 1, 97-150; the abbrevi­ations for Leibniz’s works are resolved in section 6). The former work deals with some issues in the theory of the syllogism, while the latter contains investigations of what is nowadays called deontic logic. Leibniz’s main aim in logic, however, was to extend the traditional syllogistic to a “Universal Calculus.” Although there exist several drafts of such a calculus which seem to have been composed for publication, none of them was eventually sent to press. So Leibniz’s logical essays appeared only posthumously. The early editions of his philosophical works, however, contained only a small selection of logical papers. It was not before the beginning of the 20th century that the majority of his logical fragments became generally accessible by the valuable edition of Louis Couturat.

Since only few manuscripts were dated by Leibniz, his logical oeuvre shall not be described here in chronological order but from a merely systematic point of view by distinguishing four groups:

  1. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism
  2. Works on the Universal Calculus
  3. Works on Propositional Logic
  4. Works on Modal Logic.

2. Works on the Theory of the Syllogism

Leibniz’s innovations within the theory of the syllogism comprise at least three topics:

(a)   An "Axiomatization" of the theory of the syllogism, that is, a reduction of the traditional inferences to a small number of basic laws which are sufficient to derive all other syllogisms.

(b)   The development of the semantics of so-called "characteristic num­bers" for evaluating the logical validity of a syllogistic inference.

(c)    The invention of two sorts of graphical devices, that is to say, linear diagrams and (later) so-called "Euler-circles," as a heuristic for checking the validity of a syllogism.

a. Axiomatization of the Theory of the Syllogism

In the 17th century, logic was still strongly influenced, if not dominated, by syllogistic, that is, by the traditional theory of the four categorical forms:

Universal affirmative proposition (UA)        Every S is P          SaP

Universal negative proposition (UN)              No S is P               SeP

Particular affirmative proposition (PA)         Some S is P          SiP

Particular negative proposition (PN)              Some S isn’t P      SoP

A typical textbook of that time is the famous “Logique de Port Royal” (Arnauld & Nicole (1683)) which, apart from an introductory investigation of ideas, concepts, and propositions in general, basically consists of:

(i)       The theory of the so-called “simple” laws of subalternation, oppo­sition, and conversion;

(ii)      The theory of the syllogistic “moods” which are classified into four different “figures” for which specific rules hold.

As Leibniz defines it, a “subalternation takes place whenever a particular proposition is inferred from the corresponding universal proposition” (Cout, 80), that is:

SUB 1            SaP → SiP

SUB 2            SeP → SoP.

According to the modern analysis of the categorical forms in terms of first order logic, these laws are not strictly valid but hold only under the assumption that the subject term S is not empty. This problem of "existential import" will be discussed below.

The theory of opposition first has to determine which propositions are contradictories of each other in the sense that they can neither be together true nor be together false. Clearly, the PN is the contradictory, or negation, of the UA, while the PA is the negation of the UN:

OPP 1            ¬SaP ↔ SoP

OPP 2            ¬SeP ↔ SiP.

The next task is to determine which propositions are contraries to each other in the sense that they cannot be together true, while they may well be together false. As Leibniz states in “Theorem 6: The universal affirmative and the universal negative are contrary to each other” (Cout, 82). Finally, two propositions are said to be subcontraries if they cannot be together false while it is possible that are together true. As Leibniz notes in another theorem, the two particular propositions, SiP and SoP, are logically related to each other in this way. The theory of subalternation and opposition is often summarized in the familiar “Square of Opposition”:


In the paper “De formis syllogismorum Mathematice definiendis” written around 1682 (Cout, 410-416, and the text-critical edition in AE VI, 4, 496-505) Leibniz tackled the task of "axiomatizing" the theory of the syllogistic figures and moods by reducing them to a small number of basic principles. The “Fundamentum syllogisticum”, that is, the axiomatic basis of the theory of the syllogism, is the “Dictum de omni et nullo” (The saying of ‘all’ and ‘none’):

If a total C falls within another total D, or if the total C falls outside D, then whatever is in C, also falls within D (in the former case) or outside D (in the latter case) (Cout, 410-411).

These laws warrant the validity of the following "perfect" moods of the “First Figure”:

BARBARA        CaD, BaC → BaD

CELARENT      CeD, BaC → BeD

DARII                 CaD, BiC → BiD

FERIO                 CeD, BiC → BoD.

On the one hand, if the second premise of the affirmative moods BARBARA and DARII is satisfied, that is, if B is either totally or partially contained in D, then, according to the “Dictum de Omni”, also B must be either totally or partially contained in D since, by the first premise, C is entirely contained in D. Similarly the negative moods CELARENT and FERIO follow from the “Dictum de Nullo”: “B is either totally or partially contained in C; but the entire C falls outside D; hence also B either totally or partially falls outside D” (Cout, 411).

Next Leibniz derives the laws of subalternation from the syllogisms DARII and FERIO by substituting ‘B’ for ‘C’ and ‘C’ for ‘D’, respectively. This derivation (and hence also the validity of the laws of subalternation) tacitly presupposes the following principle which Leibniz considered as an “identity”:

SOME             BiB.

With the help of the laws of subalternation, BARBARA and CELARENT may be "weakened" into

BARBARI      CaD, BaC → BiD

CELARO        CeD, BaC → BoD.

Thus the First Figure altogether has six valid moods, from which one obtains six moods of the Second and six of the Third Figure by means of a logical inference-scheme called “Regressus”:

REGRESS      If a conclusion Q logically follows from premises P1, P2, but if Q is false, then one of the premises must be false.

When Leibniz carefully carries out these derivations, he presupposes the laws of opposition, Opp 1, Opp 2. Finally, six valid moods of the Fourth Figure can be derived from corresponding moods of the First Figure with the help of the laws of conversions.According to traditional doctrines, the PA and the UN may be converted “simpliciter”, while the UA can only be converted “per accidens”:

CONV 1          BiD → DiB

CONV 2          BeD → DeB

CONV 3          BaD → DiB.

As Leibniz shows, these laws can in turn be derived from some previously proven syllogisms with the help of the "identical" proposition:

ALL                BaB.

Furthermore one easily obtains another law of conversion according to which the UN can also be converted "accidentally":

CONV 4          BeD → DoB.

The announced derivation of the moods of the Fourth Figure was not carried out in the fragment “De formis syllogismorum Mathematice definiendis” which just breaks off with a reference to “Figura Quarta”. It may, however, be found in the manuscript LH IV, 6, 14, 3 which, unfortunately, was only partially edited in Cout, 204. At any rate, Leibniz managed to prove that all valid moods can be reduced to the “Fundamentum syllogisticum” in conjunction with the laws of opposition, the inference scheme “Regressus”, and the "identical" propositions SOME and ALL.

Now while ALL is an identity or theorem of first order logic, ∀x(Bx → Bx), SOME is nowadays interpreted as ∃x(Bx ∧ Bx). This formula is equivalent to ∃x(Bx), that is, to the assumption that there "exists" at least one x such that x is B. Hence the laws of subalternation presuppose that each concept B (which can occupy the position of the subject of a categorical form) is "non-empty". Leibniz discussed this problem of "existential import" in a paper entitled “Difficultates quaedam logicae” (GP 7, 211-217) where he distinguished two kinds of "existence": Actual existence of the individuals inhabiting our real world vs. merely possible subsistence of individuals “in the region of ideas”. According to Leibniz, logical inferences should always be evaluated with reference to “the region of ideas”, that is, the larger set of all possible individuals. Therefore all that is required for the validity of subalternation is that the term B occupying the position of the subject of a categorical form has a non-empty extension within the domain of possible individuals. As will turn out below (compare the definition of an extensional interpretation of L1 in section 3.1), this weak condition of "existential import" becomes tantamount to the assumption that the respective concept B is self-consistent!

b. The Semantics of “Characteristic Numbers”

In a series of papers of April 1679, Leibniz elaborated the idea of assigning natural numbers to the subject and predicate of a proposition a in such a way that the truth of a can be "read off" from these numbers. Apparently Leibniz was hoping that mankind might once discover the "true" characteristic numbers which would enable one to determine the truth of arbitrary propositions just by mathematical calculations! In the essays of April 1679, however, he pursued only the much more modest goal of defining appropriate arithmetical conditions for determining whether a syllogistic inference is logically valid. This task was guided by the idea that a term composed of concepts A and B gets assigned the product of the numbers assigned to the components:

For example, since ‘man’ is ‘rational animal’, if the number of ‘animal’, a, is 2, and the number of ‘rational’, r, is 3, then the number of ‘man’, m, will be the same as a*r, in this example 2*3 or 6. (LLP, 17).

Now a UA like ‘All gold is metal’ can be understood as maintaining that the concept ‘gold’ contains the concept ‘metal’ (because ‘gold’ can be defined as ‘the heaviest metal’). Therefore it seems obvious to postulate that in general ‘Every S is P’ is true if and only if s, the characteristic number assigned to S, contains p, the number assigned to P, as a prime factor; or, in other words, s must be divisible by p. In a first approach, Leibniz thought that the truth-conditions for the particular proposition ‘Some S are P’ might be construed similarly by requiring that either s can be divided by p or conversely p can be divided by s. But this was mistaken. After some trials and errors, Leibniz found the following more complicated solution:

(i)     To every term T, a pair of natural numbers <+t1;-t2> is assigned such that t1 and t2 are relatively prime, that is, they don’t have a common divisor.

(ii)    The UA ‘Every S is P’ is true (relative to the assignment (i)) if and only if +s1 is divisible by +p1 and -s2 is divisible by -p2.

(iii)   The UN ‘No S is P’ is true if and only if +s1 and -p2 have a common divisor or +p1 and -s2 have a common divisor.

(iv)   The PA ‘Some S is P’ is true if and only if condition (iii) is not satisfied.

(v)    The PN ‘Some S isn’t P’ is true if and only if condition (ii) is not satisfied.

(vi)   An inference from premises P1, P2 to the conclusion C is logically valid if and only if for each assignment of numbers satisfying condition (i), C becomes true whenever both P1 and P2 are true.

As was shown by Lukasiewicz (1951), this semantics satisfies the simple inferences of opposition, subalternation, and conversion, as well as all (and only) the syllogisms which are commonly regarded as valid. Leibniz tried to generalize this semantics for the entire algebra of concepts, but he never found a way to cope with negative concepts. This problem has only been solved by contemporary logicians; compare Sanchez-Mazas (1979), Sotirov (1999).

c. Linear Diagrams and Euler-circles

In the paper “De Formae Logicae Comprobatione per Linearum ductus” probably written after 1686 (Cout, 292-321), Leibniz elaborated two methods for representing the content of categorical propositions. The UA, for example, ‘Every man is an animal’, can be represented either by two nested circles or by two horizontal lines which symbolize that the extension of B is contained in the extension of C (the subsequent graphics are scans from Cout, 292-295):


In the case of a UN like ‘No man is a stone’, one obtains the following diagrams which symbolize that the extension of B is set-theoretically disjoint from the extension of C:


Similarly, the following circles and lines symbolize that, in the case of a PA like ‘Some men are wise’, the extensions of B and C overlap:


Finally, in the case of a PN like ‘Some men are not ruffians’, the diagrams are meant to symbolize that the extension of B is partially disjoint from the extension of C,that is, that some elements of B are not elements of C:


These diagrams may then be used to check whether a given inference is valid. Thus, for example, the validity of FERIO can be illustrated as follows:


Here the conclusion ‘Some D is not B’ follows from the premises ‘No C is B’ and ‘Some D is C’ because the elements of D which are in C can’t be elements of B. On the other hand, invalid syllogisms as, for example, the mood “AOO” of the Fourth Figure, can be refuted as follows:


As the diagram illustrates, the truth of the premises ‘Every B is C’ and ‘Some C is not D’ is compatible with a situation where the conclusion ‘Some D is not B’ is false, that is, where ‘Every D is B’ is true.

Of course, Leibniz’s diagrams which were re-discovered in the 18th century among others by Euler (1768) are not without problems. In particular, the circles for the PA and the PN are somewhat inaccurate because they basic­ally visualize one and the same state of affairs, namely that (i) some B are C, and (ii) some B are not C, and also (iii) some C are not B. The need to distinguish between different situations such as ((i) & (ii)) in contrast to ((i) & not (ii)) led to improvements of the method of "Euler-circles" as suggested by Venn (1881), Hamilton (1861), and others. Note, incidentally, that, in the GI, Leibniz himself improved the linear diagrams for the UA, PA and PN by drawing perpendicular lines symbolizing the “maximum”,that is, “the limits beyond which the terms cannot, and within which they can, be extended”. At the same time he used a double horizontal line to symbolize “the minimum, that is, that which cannot be taken away without affecting the relation of the terms” (LLP, 73-4, fn. 2).

3. Works on the Universal Calculus

In the period between, roughly, 1679 and 1690, Leibniz spent much effort to generalize the traditional logic to a “Universal Calculus”. At least three different calculi may be distinguished:

(a) The algebra of concepts which is provably equivalent to the Boolean algebra of sets;

(b)   A fragmentary quantificational system in which the quantifiers range over concepts but in which quantification over individuals may be introduced by definition;

(c) The so-called "Plus-Minus-calculus" which constitutes an abstract system of "real addition" and "subtraction". When this calculus is applied to concepts, it yields a weaker logic than the full algebra (a).

a. The Algebra of Concepts L1

The algebra of concepts grows out of the syllogistic framework by three achievements. First, Leibniz drops the informal quantifier expression ‘every’ and formulates the UA simply as “A is B” or, equivalently, as “A contains B”. This fundamental proposition shall here be symbolized as A∈B while its negation will be abbreviated as A∉B. Second, Leibniz introduces an operator of conceptual conjunction which combines two concepts A and B into AB (sometimes also written as “A+B”). Third, Leibniz allows the unrestricted use of conceptual negation which shall here be symbolized as ~A (“Not-A”). Hence, in particular, one can form the inconsistent concept A~A (“A Not-A”) and its tautological counterpart ~(A~A).

Identity or coincidence of concepts might be defined as mutual containment:

DEF 1            (A = B) =df (A∈B) ∧ (B∈A).

Alternatively, the algebra of concepts can be built up with ‘=’ as a primitive operator while ‘∈’ is defined by:

DEF 2            (A∈B) =df (A = AB).

Another important operator may be introduced by definition. Concept B is possible if B does not contain a contradiction like A~A:

DEF 3            P(B) =df (B∉A~A).

Leibniz uses many different locutions to express the self-consistency of a concept A. Instead of ‘A est possibile’ he often says ‘A est res’, ‘A est ens’; or simply ‘A est’. In the opposite case of an impossible concept he also calls A a "false term" (“terminus falsus”).

Identity can be axiomatized by the law of reflexivity in conjunction with the rule of substitutivity:

IDEN 1            A = A

IDEN 2            If A = B, then α[A] ↔ α[B].

By means of these principles, one easily derives the following corollaries:

IDEN 3            A = B → B = A

IDEN 4            A = B ∧ B = C → A = C

IDEN 5            A = B → ~A = ~B

IDEN 6            A = B → AC = BC.

The following laws express the reflexivity and the transitivity of the containment relation:

CONT 1          A∈A

CONT 2          A∈B ∧ B∈C → A∈C.

The most fundamental principle for the operator of conceptual conjunction says: “That A contains B and A contains C is the same as that A contains BC” (LLP, 58, fn. 4), that is,

CONJ 1          A∈BC ↔ A∈B ∧ A∈C.

Conjunction then satisfies the following laws:

CONJ 2          AA = A

CONJ 3          AB = BA

CONJ 4          AB∈A

CONJ 5          AB∈B.

The next operator is conceptual negation, ‘not’. Leibniz had serious problems with finding the proper laws governing this operator. From the tradition, he knew little more than the “law of double negation”:

CONJ 1            ~~A = A

One important step towards a complete theory of conceptual negation was to transform the informal principle of contraposition, ‘Every A is B, therefore Every Not-B is Not-A’ into the following principle:

NEG 2            A∈B ↔ ~B∈~A.

Furthermore Leibniz discovered various variants of the “law of consistency”:

NEG 3            A ≠ ~A

NEG 4            A = B → A ≠ ~B.

NEG 5*           A∉~A

NEG 6*           A∈B → A∉~B.

In the GI, these principles are formulated as follows: “A proposition false in itself is ‘A coincides with Not-A’” (§ 11); “If A = B, then A ≠ Not-B” (§ 171); “It is false that B contains Not-B, that is, B doesn’t contain Not-B” (§ 43); and “A is B, therefore A isn’t Not-B” (§ 91).

Principles NEG 5* and NEG 6* have been marked with a ‘*’ in order to indicate that the laws as stated by Leibniz are not absolutely valid but have to be restricted to self-consistent terms:

NEG 5            P(A) → A∉~A

NEG 6            P(A) → (A∈B → A∉~B).

The following two laws describe some characteristic relations between the possibility-operator P and the other operators of L1:

POSS 1           A∈B ∧ P(A) → P(B)

POSS 2           A∈B ↔ ¬P(A~B).

All these principles have been discovered by Leibniz himself who thus provided an almost complete axiomatization of L1. As a matter of fact, the "intensional" algebra of concept can be proven to be equivalent to Boole’s extensional algebra of sets provided that one adds the following counterpart of the “ex contradictorio quodlibet”:

NEG 7            (A~A)∈B.

As regards the relation of conceptual containment, A∈B, it is important to observe that Leibniz’s standard formulation ‘A contains B’ expresses the so-called "intensional" view of concepts as ideas, while we here want to develop an extensional interpretation in terms of the sets of individuals that fall under the concepts. Leibniz explained the mutual relationship between the "intensional" and the extensional point of view in the following passage from the “New Essays on Human understanding”:

The common manner of statement concerns individuals, whereas Aristotle’s refers rather to ideas or universals. For when I say Every man is an animal I mean that all the men are included among all the animals; but at the same time I mean that the idea of animal is included in the idea of man. ‘Animal’ comprises more individuals than ‘man’ does, but ‘man’ comprises more ideas or more attributes: one has more instances, the other more degrees of reality; one has the greater extension, the other the greater intension. (NE, Book IV, ch. XVII, § 8; compare the original French version in GP 5, 469).

If 'Int(A)’ and 'Ext(A)’ abbreviate the "intension" and the extension of a concept A, respectively, then the so-called law of reciprocity can be formalized as follows:

RECI               Int(A) ⊆ Int (B) ↔ Ext(A) ⊇ Ext(B).

From this it immediately follows that two concepts A, B have the same "intension" iff they have the same extension. This somewhat surprising result might seem to unveil an inadequacy of Leibniz’s conception. However, "intensionality" in the sense of traditional logic must not be mixed up with intensionality in the modern sense. Furthermore, in Leibniz’s view, the extension of a concept A is not just the set of actually existing individuals, but rather the set of all possible individuals that fall under concept A. Therefore one may define the concept of an extensional interpretation of L1 in accordance with Leibniz’s ideas as follows:

DEF 4      Let U be a non-empty set (the domain of all possible indi­viduals), and let ϕ be a function such that ϕ(A) ⊆ U for each concept-letter A. Then ϕ is an extensional interpretation of L1 if and only if:

(1) ϕ(A∈B) = true iff ϕ(A) ⊆ ϕ(B);

(2) ϕ(A=B) = true iff ϕ(A) = ϕ(B);

(3) ϕ(AB) = ϕ(A) ∩ ϕ(B);

(4) ϕ(~A) = complement of ϕ(A);

(5) ϕ(P(A)) = true iff ϕ(A) ≠ ∅.

Conditions (1) and (2) are straightforward consequences of RECI. Condition (3) also is trivial since it expresses that an individual x belongs to the extension of AB just in case that x belongs to the extension of both concepts (and hence to their intersection). According to condition (4), the extension of the negative concept ~A is just the set of all individuals which do not fall under the concept A. Condition (5) says that a concept A is possible if and only if it has a non-empty extension.

At first sight, this requirement appears inadequate, since there are certain concepts – such as that of a unicorn – which happen to be empty but which may nevertheless be regarded as possible, that is, not involving a contradiction. However, the universe of discourse underlying the extensional interpretation of L1 does not consist of actually existing objects only, but instead comprises all possible individuals. Therefore the non-emptiness of the extension of A is both necessary and sufficient for guaranteeing the self-consistency of A. Clearly, if A is possible, then there must be at least one possible individual x that falls under concept A.

It has often been noted that Leibniz’s logic of concepts lacks the operator of disjunction. Although this is by and large correct, it doesn’t imply any defect or any incompleteness of the system L1 because the operator A∨B may simply be introduced by definition:

DISJ 1            A∨B =df ~(~A ~B).

On the background of the above axioms of negation and conjunction, the standard laws for disjunction, for example

DISJ 2            A∈(A∨B)

DISJ 3            B∈(A∨B)

DISJ 4            A∈C ∧ B∈C → (A∨B)∈C,

then become provable (Lenzen (1984)).

b. The Quantificational System L2

Leibniz’s quantifier logic L2 emerges from L1 by the introduction of so-called “indefinite concepts”. These concepts are symbolized by letters from the end of the alphabet X, Y, Z ..., and they function as quantifiers ranging over concepts. Thus, in the GI, Leibniz explains:

(16) An affirmative proposition is ‘A is B’ or ‘A contains B’ [...]. That is, if we substitute the value for A, one obtains ‘A coincides with BY’. For example, ‘Man is an animal’, that is, ‘Man’ is the same as ‘a ... animal’ (namely, ‘Man’ is ‘rational animal’). For by the sign ‘Y’ I mean something undetermined, so that ‘BY’ is the same as ‘Some B’, or ‘A ... animal’ [...], or ‘A certain animal’. So ‘A is B’ is the same as ‘A coincides with some B’, that is, ‘A = BY’.

With the help of the modern symbol for the existential quantifier, the latter law can be expressed more precisely as follows:

CONT 3          A∈B ↔ ∃Y(A = BY).

As Leibniz himself noted, the formalization of the UA according to CONT 3 is provably equivalent to the simpler representation according to DEF 2:

It is noteworthy that for ‘A = BY’ one can also say ‘A = AB’ so that there is no need to introduce a new letter. (Cout, 366; compare also LLP, 56, fn. 1.)

On the one hand, according to the rule of existential generalization,

EXIST 1          If α[A], then ∃Yα[Y],

A = AB immediately entails ∃Y(A = YB). On the other hand, if there exists some Y such that A = YB, then according to IDEN 6, AB = YBB, that is, AB = YB and hence (by the premise A = YB) AB = A. (This proof incidentally was given by Leibniz himself in the important paper “Primaria Calculi Logic Fundamenta” of August 1690; Cout, 235).

Next observe that Leibniz often used to formalize the PA ‘Some A is B’ by means of the indefinite concept Y as ‘YA∈B’. In view of CONT 3, this repre­sentation might be transformed into the (elliptic) equation YA = ZB. However, both formalizations are somewhat inadequate because they are easily seen to be theorems of L2! According to CONJ 4, BA contains B, hence by EXIST 1:

CONJ 6          ∃Y(YA∈B).

Similarly, since, according to CONJ 3, AB = BA, a twofold application of EXIST 1 yields:

CONJ 7          ∃Y∃Z(YA = BZ).

These tautologies, of course, cannot adequately represent the PA which for an appropriate choice of concepts A and B may become false! In order to resolve these difficulties, consider a draft of a calculus probably written between 1686 and 1690 (compare Cout, 259-261, and the text-critical edition in AE, VI, 4, # 171), where Leibniz proved principle:

NEG 8*           A∉B ↔ ∃Y(YA∈~B).

On the one hand, it is interesting to see that after first formulating the right hand side of the equivalence, "as usual", in the elliptic way ‘YA is Not-B’, Leibniz later paraphrased it by means of the explicit quantifier expression “there exists a Y such that YA is Not-B”. On the other hand, Leibniz discovered that NEG 8* has to be improved by requiring more exactly that there exists a Y such that YA contains ~B and YA is possible, that is, Y must be compatible with A:

NEG 8            A∉B ↔ ∃Y(P(YA) ∧ YA∈~B).

Leibniz’s proof of this important law is quite remarkable:

(18) […] to say ‘A isn’t B’ is the same as to say ‘there exists a Y such that YA is Not-B’. If ‘A is B’ is false, then ‘A Not-B’ is possible by [POSS 2]. ‘Not-B’ shall be called ‘Y’. Hence YA is possible. Hence YA is Not-B. Therefore we have shown that, if it is false that A is B, then QA is Not-B. Conversely, let us show that if QA is Not-B, ‘A is B’ is false. For if ‘A is B’ would be true, ‘B’ could be substituted for ‘A’ and we would obtain ‘QB is Not-B’ which is absurd. (Cout, 261)

To conclude the sketch of L2, let us consider some of the rare passages where an indefinite concept functions as a universal quantifier. In the above quoted draft (Cout, 260), Leibniz put forward principle “(15) ‘A is B’ is the same as ‘If L is A, it follows that L is B’”:

CONT 4          A∈B ↔ ∀Y(Y∈A → Y∈B).

Furthermore, in § 32 GI, Leibniz at least vaguely recognized that just as A∈B (according to CONJ 6) is equivalent to ∃Y(A = YB), so the negation A∉B means that, for any indefinite concept Y, A ≠ BY:

CONT 5          A∉B ↔ ∀Y(A ≠ YB).

According to AE, VI, 4, 753, Leibniz had written: “(32) Propositio Negativa. A non continet B, seu A esse (continere) B falsum est, seu A non coincidit BY”. Unfortunately, the last passage ‘seu A non coincidit BY’ had been overlooked by Couturat and it is therefore also missing in Parkinson’s translation in LLP! Anyway, with the help of ‘∀’, one can formalize Leibniz’s conception of individual concepts as maximally-consistent concepts as follows:

IND 1             Ind(A) ↔df P(A) ∧ ∀Y(P(AY) → A∈Y).

Thus A is an individual concept iff A is "self-consistent and A contains every concept Y which is compatible with A. The underlying idea of the complete­ness of individual concepts had been formulated in § 72 GI as follows:

So if BY is ["being"], and the indefinite term Y is superfluous, that is, in the way that ‘a certain Alexander the Great’ and ‘Alexander the Great’ are the same, then B is an individual. If the term BA is ["being"] and if B is an individual, then A will be superfluous; or if BA=C, then B=C (LLP 65, § 72 + fn. 1; for a closer interpretation of this idea, see Lenzen (2004c)).

Note, incidentally, that IND 1 might be simplified by requiring that, for each concept Y, A either contains Y or contains ~Y:

IND 2             Ind(A) ↔ ∀Y(A∈~Y ↔ A∉Y).

As a corollary it follows that the invalid principle

NEG 9*          A∉B → A∈~B,

which Leibniz again and again had considered as valid, in fact holds only for individual concepts:

NEG 9            Ind(A) → (A∉B → A∈~B).

Already in the “Calculi Universalis Investigationes” of 1679, Leibniz had pointed out:

…If two propositions are given with exactly the same singular [!] subject, where the predicate of the one is contradictory to the predicate of the other, then necessarily one proposition is true and the other is false. But I say: exactly the same [singular] subject, for example, ‘This gold is a metal’, ‘This gold is a not-metal.’ (AE VI, 4, 217-218).

The crucial issue here is that NEG 9* holds only for an individual concept like, for example, ‘Apostle Peter’, but not for general concepts as, for example, ‘man’. The text-critical apparatus of AE reveals that Leibniz was somewhat diffident about this decisive point. He began to illustrate the above rule by the correct example “if I say ‘Apostle Peter was a Roman bishop’, and ‘Apostle Peter was not a Roman bishop’” and then went on, erroneously, to generalize this law for arbitrary terms: “or if I say ‘Every man is learned’ ‘Every man is not learned’.” Finally he noticed this error “Here it becomes evident that I am mistaken, for this rule is not valid.” The long story of Leibniz’s cardinal mistake of mixing up ‘A isn’t B’ and ‘A is not-B’ is analyzed in detail in Lenzen (1986).

There are many different ways to represent the categorical forms by formulas of L1 or L2. The most straightforward formalization would be the following "homogenous" schema in terms of conceptual containment:

UA   A∈B                                    UN   A∈~B

PA   A∉~B                                  PN   A∉B.

The "homogeneity" consists in two facts:

(a)   The formula for the UN is obtained from that of the UA by replacing the predicate B with its negation, ~B. This is the formal counterpart of the traditional principle of obversion according to which, for example, ‘No A is B’ is equivalent to ‘Every A is not-B’.

(b)  In accordance with the traditional laws of opposition, the formulas for the particular propositions are just taken as the negations of corresponding universal propositions.

In view of DEF 2, the first schema may be transformed into

UA   A = AB                                UN   A = A~B

PA   A ≠ A~B                               PN   A ≠ AB.

Similarly, by means of the fundamental law POSS 2, one obtains

UA   ¬P(A~B)                              UN   ¬P(AB)

PA   P(AB)                                   PN   P(A~B).

Furthermore, with the help of indefinite concepts, one can formulate, for example,

UA   ∃Y(A = YB)                          UN   ∃Y(A = Y~B)

PA   ∀Y(A ≠ Y~B)                        PN   ∀Y(A ≠ YB).

Leibniz used to work with various elements of these representations, often combining them into complicated inhomogeneous schemata such as:

“A = YB           is the UA, where the adjunct Y is like an additional unknown term: ‘Every man’ is the same as ‘A certain animal’.

YA = ZB           is the PA. ‘Some man’ or ‘Man of a certain kind’ is the same as ‘A certain learned’.

A = Y not-B      [is the UN] No man is a stone, that is, Every man is a not-stone, that is, ‘Man’ and ‘A certain not-stone’ coincide.

YA = Z not-B    [is the PN] A certain man isn’t learned or is not-learned, that is, ‘A certain man’ and ‘A certain not-learned’ coincide” (Cout, 233-234).

But the representations of PA and PN of this schema are inadequate because the formulas ‘[∃Y∃Z](YA = ZB)’ and ‘[∃Y∃Z](YA = Z~B)’ are theorems of L2! These conditions may, however, easily be corrected by adding the require­ment that YA is self-consistent:

UA   ∃Y(A = YB)                                  UN   ∃Y(A = Y~B)

PA   ∃Y∃Z(P(YA) ∧ YA = ZB)        PN   ∃Y∃Z(P(YA) ∧ YA = Z~B).

Already in the paper “De Formae Logicae Comprobatione per Linearum ductus”, Leibniz had made numerous attempts to prove the basic laws of syllogistic with the help of these schemata. He continued these efforts in two interesting fragments of August 1690 dealing with “The Primary Bases of a Logical Calculus” (LLP, 90 – 92 + 93-94; compare also the closely related essays “Principia Calculi rationalis” in Cout, 229-231 and the untitled fragments Cout, 259-261 + 261-264). In the end, however, Leibniz remained unsatisfied with his attempts.

To be sure, a complete proof of the theory of the syllogism could easily be obtained by drawing upon the full list of "axioms" for L1 and L2 as stated above. But Leibniz more ambitiously tried to find proofs which presuppose only a small number of "self-evident" laws for identity. In particular, he was not willing to adopt principle

(17) Not-B = not-B not-(AB), that is, Not-B contains Not-AB, or Not-B is not-AB

as a fundamental axiom which therefore needs not itself be demonstrated. Although Leibniz realized that (17) is equivalent to the law of contraposition repeated in the subsequent §

(19) ‘A = AB’ and ‘Not-B = Not-B Not-A’ are equivalent. This is conversion by contraposition (Cout, 422),

he still thought it necessary to prove this "axiom": “This remains to be demonstrated in our calculus”!

c. The Plus-Minus-Calculus

The so-called Plus-Minus-Calculus was mainly developed in the paper “Non inelegans specimen demonstrandi in abstractis” of around 1686/7 (compare GP 7, ## XIX, XX and the text-critical edition in AE VI, 4, ## 177, 178; English translations are provided in LLP, 122-130 + 131-144). Strictly speaking, the Plus-Minus-Calculus is not a logical calculus but rather a much more general calculus which admits of different applications and interpretations. In its abstract form, it should be regarded as a theory of set-theoretical containment, set-theoretical "addition", and set-theoretical "subtraction". Unlike modern systems of set-theory, however, Leibniz’s calculus has no counterpart of the relation ‘x is an element of A’; and it also lacks the operator of set-theoretical "negation", that is, set-theoretical complement! The complement of set A might, though, be defined with the help of the subtraction operator as (U-A) where the constant ‘U’ designates the universe of discourse. But, in Leibniz’s calculus, this additional logical element is lacking.

Leibniz’s drafts exhibit certain inconsistencies which result from the experi­mental character of developing the laws for "real" addition and subtraction in close analogy to the laws of arithmetical addition and subtraction. The genesis of this idea is described in detail in Lenzen (1989). The incon­sistencies might be removed basically in two ways. First, one might restrict A-B to the case where B is contained in A; such a conservative reconstruction of the Plus-Minus-Calculus has been developed in Dürr (1930). The second, more rewarding alternative consists in admitting the operation of "real subtraction" A-B also if B is not contained in A. In any case, however, one has to give up Leibniz’s idea that subtraction might yield "privative" entities which are "less than nothing".

In the following reconstruction, Leibniz’s symbols ‘+’ for the addition (that is, union) and ‘-’ for the subtraction of sets are adopted, while his informal expressions ‘Nothing’ (“nihil”) and ‘is in’ (“est in”) are replaced by the modern symbols ‘∅’ and ‘⊆’. Set-theoretical identity may be treated either as a primitive or as a defined operator. In the former case, inclusion can be defined either by A⊆B =df ∃Y(A+Y = B) or simpler as A⊆B =df (A+B = B). If, conversely, inclusion is taken as primitive, identity can be defined as mutual inclusion: A=B =df (A⊆B) ∧ (B⊆A) (see, for example, Definition 3, Propositions 13 +14 and Proposition 17 in LLP, 131-144).

Set-theoretical addition is symmetric, or, as Leibniz puts it, “transposition makes no difference here” (LLP, 132):

PLUS 1           A+B = B+A.

The main difference between arithmetical addition and "real addition" is that the addition of one and the same "real" thing (or set of things) doesn’t yield anything new:

PLUS 2           A+A = A.

As Leibniz puts it (LLP, 132): “A+A = A […] that is, repetition changes nothing. (For although four coins and another four coins are eight coins, four coins and the same four already counted are not)”.

The "real nothing", that is, the empty set ∅, is characterized as follows: “It does not matter whether Nothing is put or not, that is, A+Nih. = A” (Cout, 267):

NIHIL 1           A+∅ = A.

In view of the relation (A⊆B) ↔ (A+B = B), this law can be transformed into:

NIHIL 2           ∅⊆A.

"Real" subtraction may be regarded as the converse operation of addition: “If the same is put and taken away [...] it coincides with Nothing. That is, A [...] - A [...] = N” (LLP, 124, Axiom 2):

MINUS 1         A-A = ∅.

Leibniz also considered the following principles which in a stronger form express that negation is the converse of addition:

MINUS 2*       (A+B)-B = A

MINUS 3*       (A+B) = C → C-B = A.

But he soon recognized that these laws do not hold in general but only in the special case where the sets A and B are “uncommunicating” (Cout, 267, # 29: “Therefore if A+B = C, then A = C-B […] but it is necessary that A and B have nothing in common”.) The new operator of “communicating” sets has to be understood as follows:

If some term, M, is in A, and the same term is in B, this term is said to be ‘common’ to them, and they will be said to be ‘communicating’. (LLP, 123, Definition 4)

Hence two sets A and B have something in common if and only if there exists some set Y such that Y⊆A and Y⊆B. Now since, trivially, the empty set is included in every set A (NIHIL 2), one has to add the qualification that Y is not empty:

COMMON 1     Com(A,B) ↔df ∃Y(Y≠∅ ∧ Y⊆A ∧ Y⊆B).

The necessary restriction of MINUS 2* and MINUS 3* can then be formalized as follows:

MINUS 2         ¬Com(A,B) → ((A+B)-B = A)

MINUS 3         ¬Com(A,B) ∧ (A+B = C) → (C-B = A).

Similarly, Leibniz recognized (LLP, 130) that from an equation A+B = A+C, A may be subtracted on both sides provided that C is “uncommunicating” both with A and with B, that is,

MINUS 4         ¬Com(A,B) ∧ ¬Com(A,C) → (A+B = A+C → B=C).

Furthermore Leibniz discovered that the implication in MINUS 2 may be converted (and hence strengthened into a biconditional). Thus one obtains the following criterion: Two sets A, B are “uncommunicating” if and only if the result of first adding and then subtracting B coincides with A. Inserting negations on both sides of this equivalence one obtains:

COMMON 2     Com(A,B) ↔ ((A+B)-B) ≠ A.

Whenever two sets A, B are communicating or “have something in common”, the intersection of A and B, in modern symbols A∩B, is not empty (LLP, 127, Case 2 of Theorem IX: “Let us assume meanwhile that E is everything which A and G have in common – if they have something in common, so that if they have nothing in common, E = Nothing”), that is,

COMMON 3     Com(A,B) ↔ A∩B ≠ ∅.

Furthermore, “What has been subtracted and the remainder are un­communicating” (LLP, 128, Theorem X), that is,

COMMON 4     ¬Com(A-B,B).

Leibniz further discovered the following formula which allows one to "calculate" the intersection or “commune” of A and B by a series of additions and subtractions: A∩B = B-((A+B)-A). In a small fragment (Cout, 250) he explained:

Suppose you have A and B and you want to know if there exists some M which is in both of them. Solution: combine those two into one, A+B, which shall be called L […] and from L one of the constituents, A, shall be subtracted […] let the rest be N; then, if N coincides with the other constituent, B, they have nothing in common. But if they do not coincide, they have something in common which can be found by subtracting the rest N [...] from B […] and there remains M, the commune of A and B, which was looked for.

4. Leibniz’s Calculus of Strict Implication

It is a characteristic feature of Leibniz’s logic that when he states and proves the laws of concept logic, he takes the requisite rules and laws of propositional logic for granted. Once the former have been established, however, the latter can be obtained from the former by observing a strict analogy between concepts and propositions which allows one to re-interpret the conceptual connectives as propositional connectives. Note, incidentally, that in the 19th century George Boole in roughly the same way first presupposed propositional logic to develop his algebra of sets, and only afterwards derived the propositional calculus out of the set-theoretical calculus. While Boole thus arrived at the classical, two-valued propositional calculus, Leibniz’s approach instead yields a modal logic of strict implication.

Leibniz outlined a simple, ingenious method to transform the algebra of concepts into an algebra of propositions. Already in the “Notationes Generales” written between 1683 and 1685 (AE VI, 4, # 131), he pointed out to the parallel between the containment relation among concepts and the implication relation among propositions. Just as the simple proposition ‘A is B’ is true, “when the predicate [A] is contained in the subject” B, so a conditional proposition ‘If A is B, then C is D’ is true, “when the consequent is contained in the antecedent” (AE VI, 4, 551). In later works Leibniz compressed this idea into formulations such as “a proposition is true whose predicate is contained in the subject or more generally whose consequent is contained in the antecedent” (Cout, 401). The most detailed explanation of this idea was given in §§ 75, 137 and 189 of the GI:

If, as I hope, I can conceive all propositions as terms, and hypotheticals as categoricals and if I can treat all propositions universally, this promises a wonderful ease in my symbolism and analysis of concepts, and will be a discovery of the greatest importance […]

We have, then, discovered many secrets of great importance for the analysis of all our thoughts and for the discovery and proof of truths. We have discovered [...] how absolute and hypothetical truths have one and the same laws and are contained in the same general theorems […]

Our principles, therefore, will be these [...] Sixth, whatever is said of a term which contains a term can also be said of a proposition from which another proposition follows (LLP, 66, 78, and 85).

To conceive all propositions in analogy to concepts means in particular that the conditional ‘If a then b’ will be logically treated like the containment relation between concepts, ‘A contains B’. Furthermore, as Leibniz explained elsewhere, negations and conjunctions of propositions are to be conceived just as negations and conjunctions of concepts. Thus one obtains the following mapping of the primitive formulas of the algebra of concepts into formulas of the algebra of propositions:

A∈B              α → β

A=B               α ↔ β

~A                 ¬α

AB                 α∧β

P(A)              ◊α

As Leibniz himself explained, the fundamental law POSS 2 does not only hold for the containment-relation between concepts but also for the entailment relation between propositions:

‘A contains B’ is a true proposition if ‘A non-B’ entails a contradiction. This applies both to categorical and to hypothetical propositions (Cout, 407).

Hence A∈B ↔ ¬P(A~B) may be “translated” into (α→β) ↔ ¬◊(α∧¬β). This formula unmistakably shows that Leibniz’s conditional is not a material but rather a strict implication. As Rescher already noted in (1954: 10), Leibniz’s account provides a definition of “entailment in terms of negation, conjunction, and the notion of possibility”, which coincides with the modern definition of strict implication put forward, for example, in Lewis & Langford (1932: 124): “The relation of strict implication can be defined in terms of negation, possibility, and product [...] Thus ‘p implies q’ [...] is to mean ‘It is false that it is possible that p should be true and q false’”. This definition is almost identical with Leibniz’s explanation in “Analysis Particularum”: “Thus if I say ‘If L is true it follows that M is true’, this means that one cannot suppose at the same time that L is true and that M is false” (AE VI, 4, 656).

Given the above “translation”, the basic axioms and theorems of the algebra of concepts can be transformed into the following laws of the algebra of propositions:

IMPL 1            α → α

IMPL 2            (α → β) ∧ (β→γ) → (α→γ)

IMPL 3            (α → β) ↔ (α ↔ α∧β)

CONJ 1          (α → β∧γ) ↔ ((α→β) ∧ (α→γ))

CONJ 2          α∧β → α

CONJ 3          α∧β → β

CONJ 4          α∧α ↔ α

CONJ 5          α∧β ↔ β∧α

NEG 1            ¬¬α ↔ α

NEG 2            ¬(α ↔ ¬α)

NEG 3            (α → β) ↔ (¬β→ ¬α)

NEG 4            ¬α → ¬(α∧β)

NEG 5            ◊α → ((α → β) → ¬(α → ¬β))

NEG 6            (α ∧¬α) → β

POSS 1           (α → β) ∧ ◊α → ◊β

POSS 2           (α → β) ↔ ¬◊(α ∧ ¬β)

POSS 3           ¬◊(α ∧ ¬α)

5. Works on Modal Logic

When people credit Leibniz with having anticipated “Possible-worlds-seman­tics”, they mostly refer to his philosophical writings, in particular to the “Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain” (NE) and to the metaphysical speculations of the “Essais de theodicée” (Theo) of 1710. Leibniz argues there that while there are infinitely many ways how God might have created the world, the real world that God finally decided to create is the best of all possible worlds. As a matter of fact, however, Leibniz has much more to offer than this over-optimistic idea (which was rightly criticized by Voltaire and, for example, in part 2 of chapter 8 of Hume’s “An Enquiry concerning Human Under­standing”). In what follows we briefly consider some of Leibniz’s early logical works where

(1)  the idea that a necessary proposition is true in each possible world (while a possible proposition is true in at least one possible world) is formally elaborated, and where

(2)  the close relation between alethic and deontic modalities is unveiled.

a. Possible-Worlds-Semantics for Alethic Modalities

The fundamental logical relations between necessity, ☐, possibility, ◊, and impossibility can be expressed, for example, by:

NEC 1            ☐(α) ↔ ¬◊(¬α)

NEC 2            ¬◊(α) ↔ ☐(¬α).

These laws were familiar already to logicians long before Leibniz. However, Leibniz "proved" these relations by means of an admirably clear analysis of modal operators in terms of “possible cases”, that is, possible worlds:

Possible is whatever can happen or what is true in some cases

Impossible is whatever cannot happen or what is true        in no […] case

Necessary is whatever cannot not happen or what is true in every […] case

Contingent is whatever can not happen or what is [not] true in some case. (AE VI, 1, 466).

As this quotation shows, Leibniz uses the notion of contingency not in the modern sense of ‘neither necessary nor impossible’ but as the simple negation of ‘necessary’. The quoted analysis of the truth-conditions for modal propositions entails the validity not only of NEC 1, 2, but also of:

NEC 3            ☐α → ◊(α)

NEC 4            ¬◊(α) → ¬(α).

Leibniz "proves" these laws by reducing them to corresponding laws for quantifiers such as: If α is true in each case, then α is true in at least one case. In the “Modalia et Elementa Juris Naturalis” of around 1679, Leibniz mentions NEC 3 and NEC 4 in passing: “Since everything which is necessary is possible, so everything that is impossible is contingent, that is, can fail to happen” (AE IV, 4, 2759). A very elliptic "proof" of these laws was already sketched in the “Elementa juris naturalis” of 1669/70 (AE VI, 1, 469).

It cannot be overlooked, however, that Leibniz’s semi-formal truth conditions, even when combined with his later views on possible worlds, fail to come up to the standards of modern possible worlds semantics, since nothing in Leibniz’s considerations corresponds to an accessibility relation among worlds.

b. Basic Principles of Deontic Logic

As has already been pointed out by Schepers (1972) and Kalinowski (1974), Leibniz saw very clearly that the logical relations between the deontic modalities obligatory, permitted and forbidden exactly mirror the corresponding relations between necessary, possible and impossible, and that therefore all laws and rules of alethic modal logic may be applied to deontic logic as well.

Just like ‘necessary’, ‘contingent’, ‘possible’ and ‘impossible’ are related to each other, so also are ‘obligatory’, ‘not obligatory’, ‘permitted’, and ‘forbidden’ (AE VI, 4, 2762).

This structural analogy goes hand in hand with the important discovery that the deontic notions can be defined by means of the alethic notions plus the additional “logical” constant of a morally perfect man (“vir bonus”). Such a virtuous man is characterized by the requirements that he strictly obeys all laws, always acts in such a way that he does no harm to anybody, and is benevolent to all other people. Given this understanding of a “vir bonus”, Leibniz explains:

Obligatory is what is necessary for the virtuous man as such.

Not obligatory is what is contingent for the virtuous man as such.

Permitted is what is possible for the virtuous man as such.

Forbidden is what is impossible for the virtuous man as such (Grua, 605).

If we express the restriction of the modal operators ☐ and ◊ to the virtuous man by means of a subscript 'v', these definitions can be formalized as follows (where the letter ‘E’ reminding of the German notion ‘erlaubt’ is taken instead of 'P' for 'permitted' in order to avoid confusions with the operator of possibility):

DEON 1          O(α) ↔ ☐v(α)

DEON 2          E(α) ↔ ◊v(α)

DEON 3          F(α) ↔ ¬◊v(α).

Now, as Leibniz mentioned in passing, all that is unconditionally necessary will also be necessary for the virtuous man:

NEC 5             ☐(α) → ☐v(α).

Hence (as was shown in more detail in Lenzen (2005)), Leibniz’s derivation of the fundamental laws for the deontic operators from corresponding laws of the alethic modal operators proceeds in much the same way as the modern reduction of deontic logic to alethic modal logic "rediscovered" almost 300 years after Leibniz by Anderson (1958).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Abbreviations for Leibniz’s works

  • AE       German Academy of Science (ed.), G. W. Leibniz, Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, Series VI, „Philosophische Schriften“, Darmstadt 1930, Berlin 1962 ff.
  • Cout   Louis Couturat (ed.), Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz, Paris (Presses universitaires de France) 1903, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1961.
  • GI      Generales Inquisitiones de Analysi Notionum et Veritatum; first edited in Cout, 356-399; text-critical edition in A, VI 4, 739-788; English trans­lation in LLP, 47-87.
  • GP     C. I. Gerhardt (ed.), Die philosophischen Schriften von G. W. Leibniz, seven volumes Berlin/Halle 1875-90, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1965.
  • Grua   Gaston Grua (ed.), G. W. Leibniz – Textes Inédits, two Volumes, Paris (Presses Universitaires de France) 1948.
  • LH       Eduard Bodemann (ed.), Die Leibniz-Handschriften der Königlichen Öffentlichen Bibliothek zu Hannover, Hannover 1895, reprint Hildesheim (Olms) 1966.
  • LLP   G. H. R. Parkinson (ed.), Leibniz Logical Papers – A Selection, Oxford (Clarendon Press), 1966.
  • NE      Nouveaux Essais sur l’entendement humain – Par l’Auteur du Système de l’Harmonie Preestablie, in GP 5, 41-509.
  • Theo  Essais de Theodicée sur la Bonté de Dieu, la Liberté de l’Homme et l’Origine du Mal, in GP 6, 21-436.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Anderson, Alan Ross (1958): “A Reduction of Deontic Logic to Alethic Modal Logic”, in Mind LXVII, 100-103.
  • Arnauld, Antoine & Nicole, Pierre (1683) : La Logique ou L’Art de Penser, 5th edition, reprint 1965 Paris (Presses universitaires de France).
  • Burkhardt, Hans (1980): Logik und Semiotik in der Philosophie von Leibniz, München (Philosophia Verlag).
  • Couturat, Louis (1901): La Logique de Leibniz d’après des documents inédits, Paris (Félix Alcan).
  • Dürr, Karl (1930): Neue Beleuchtung einer Theorie von Leibniz - Grundzüge des Logikkalküls, Darmstadt.
  • Euler, Leonhard (1768): Lettres à une princesse d'Allemagne sur quelques sujets de physique et de philosophie, St Petersburg, 1768–1772.
  • Hamilton, William (1861): Lectures on Metaphysics and Logic, ed. by H.L. Mansel & J. Veitch, Edinburgh, London (William Blackwood); reprint Stuttgart Bad Cannstadt 1969.
  • Ishiguro, Hidé (1972): Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language, London (Duckworth).
  • Kalinowski, George (1974): “Un logicien déontique avant la lettre: Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz”, in Archiv für Rechts- und Sozialphilosophie 60, 79-98.
  • Kauppi, Raili (1960): Über die Leibnizsche Logik mit besonderer Berücksichti­gung des Problems der Intension und der Extension, Helsinki (Acta Philosophica Fennica).
  • Kneale, William and Martha (1962): The Development of Logic, Oxford (Clarendon).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1984): “Leibniz und die Boolesche Algebra”, in Studia Leibnitiana 16, 187-203.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1986): “‘Non est’ non est ‘est non’ – Zu Leibnizens Theorie der Negation”, in Studia Leibnitiana 18, 1-37.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1989): “Arithmetical vs. 'Real' Addition – A Case Study of the Relation between Logic, Mathematics, and Metaphysics in Leibniz”, in N. Rescher (ed.), Leibnizian Inquiries – A Group of Essays, Lanham, 149-157.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (1990): Das System der Leibnizschen Logik, Berlin (de Gruyter).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004a): Calculus Universalis – Studien zur Logik von G. W. Leibniz, Paderborn (mentis).
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004b): “Leibniz’s Logic”, in D. Gabbay & J. Woods (eds.) The Rise of Modern Logic – From Leibniz to Frege (Handbook of the History of Logic, vol. 3), Amsterdam (Elsevier), 1-83.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2004c): “Logical Criteria for Individual(concept)s”, in M. Carrara, A. M. Nunziante & G. Tomasi (eds.), Individuals, Minds, and Bodies: Themes from Leibniz, Stuttgart (Steiner), 87-107.
  • Lenzen, Wolfgang (2005): “Leibniz on Alethic and Deontic Modal Logic”. In D. Berlioz & F. Nef (eds.), Leibniz et les Puissances du Langage, Paris (Vrin), 2005, 341-362.
  • Lewis, Clarence I. & Langford, Cooper H. (1932): Symbolic Logic, New York, 21959 (Dover Publications).
  • Liske M.-Th. (1994): "Ist eine reine Inhaltslogik möglich? Zu Leibniz’ Begriffs­theorie", in Studia Leibnitiana XXVI, 31-55.
  • Lukasiewicz, Jan (1951): Aristotle’s Syllogistic – From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic, Oxford (Clarendon Press).
  • Mugnai, Massimo (1992): Leibniz’s Theory of Relations, Stuttgart (Steiner).
  • Poser, Hans (1969): Zur Theorie der Modalbegriffe bei G. W. Leibniz, Wiesbaden (Steiner).
  • Rescher, Nicholas (1954): “Leibniz’s interpretation of his logical calculus”, in Journal of Symbolic Logic 19, 1-13.
  • Rescher, Nicholas (1979): Leibniz – An Introduction to his Philosophy, London (Billing & Sons).
  • Sanchez-Mazas, Miguel (1979): “Simplification de l’arithmétisation leibniti­enne de la syllogistique par l’expression arithmétique de la notion intensionelle du 'non ens'”, in Studia Leibnitiana Sonderheft 8, 46-58.
  • Schepers, Heinrich (1972): “Leibniz‘ Disputationen ‚De Conditionibus‘: An­sätze zu einer juristischen Aussagenlogik” in Studia Leibnitiana Supplementa XV, 1-17.
  • Schupp, Franz (ed.) (1982): G. W. Leibniz, Allgemeine Untersuchungen über die Analyse der Begriffe und Wahrheiten, Hamburg (Meiner).
  • Schupp, Franz (ed.) (2000): G. W. Leibniz, Die Grundlagen des logischen Kalküls, Hamburg (Meiner).
  • Swoyer, Chris (1995): “Leibniz on Intension and Extension”, in Noûs 29, 96-114.
  • Sotirov, Vladimir (1999): “Arithmetizations of Syllogistic à la Leibniz”, in Journal of Applied Non-Classical Logics 9, 387-405.
  • Venn, John (1881): Symbolic Logic, London (MacMillan).


Author Information

Wolfgang Lenzen
University of Osnabrück

Hugo Grotius (1583—1645)

GrotiusHugo Grotius was a Dutch humanist and jurist whose philosophy of natural law had a major impact on the development of seventeenth century political thought and on the moral theories of the Enlightenment. Valorized by contemporary international theorists as the father of international law, his work on sovereignty, international rights of commerce and the norms of just war continue to inform theories of the international legal order. His major work, De Jure Belli ac Pacis (The Rights of War and Peace), is particularly notable in this respect, as well as Mare Liberum, a doctrine in favor of the freedom of the seas, which is considered an antecedent, inspiration and the backbone of the modern law of the sea.

Grotius was heavily influenced by classical philosophy, most prominently Aristotle and the Stoics, as well as by the contemporary humanist tradition and the late-medieval Scholastics. Caught up in the religious strife of the Reformation, Grotius promoted an irenic vision that would unite and reconcile the Christian Church on the principles of civil religion and toleration. He was well known in his time as much for his poetry and philosophy of religion as for his work on law and politics but is best remembered for his influence on theories of the social contract, natural rights and the laws of war.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Irenicism and Tolerance
    1. Religion and Civil Authority
    2. Relations with Non-Christians
    3. Christian Unity and Peace
  3. Sovereignty and Imperialism
    1. Divisible Sovereignty
    2. Resistance, War and Empire
  4. Natural Right and the Law of Nations
    1. Obligations from Nature and Custom
    2. Just War: Jus ad Bellum
    3. Just War: Jus in Bello
  5. Scholarly Interest in Grotius
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

Huig de Groot, best known by the Latinized name Hugo Grotius, began his life in the commercial town of Delft while, in 1583, the Dutch Republic persevered through a second decade of war for independence from Hapsburg rule and was already positioning itself for ascendancy as an overseas trading power. Born into a family with standing among the city elite and connections to the recently founded University of Leiden, young Hugo would find many opportunities to develop his considerable talents for scholarly pursuits even as a child. His family tutored him in Greek and Latin at an early age, introduced him to classical letters, and brought him up in the disciplines of Reformed faith. So outstanding were his gifts for intellectual work that he was welcomed to enroll at Leiden University at the mere age of eleven. At the university, the boy de Groot became a favored student of some of the most celebrated scholars of the time, discovering his talents in a whole range of subjects in the liberal arts and new sciences. His reputation as a promising young man of letters would open a number of doors for him in the political life of the time, where humanist expertise was a valued asset. The most auspicious of these opportunities came as he was preparing for life beyond the university. In 1598, no less a figure than Jan van Oldenbarnevelt, the Grand Pensionary and most influential personality in Dutch politics, invited Grotius to accompany his delegation to the French court. The embassy, which ultimately failed in its aim to renew the king’s military support against Spain, nonetheless brought Grotius into the fold of high politics and even staked him a reputation with the French court when Henry IV lauded the learned youth as “the miracle of Holland.” The connections he made in France enabled Grotius to extend his stay and earn a Doctor of Laws degree from the University of Orléans before returning to Holland the following year.

Entering into practice as a lawyer in The Hague, Grotius took advantage of chances to hone his rhetorical skills and found time to devote to his diverse scholarly interests. His earliest writings to go into print included several imitations of classical verse and translations of significant works in compass navigation and astronomy, the latter being of keen interest to his friends invested in the burgeoning overseas trade. In 1601, he published a tragedy, Adamus Exul (Adam in Exile), that earned him instant acclaim as a poet; it was a work that John Milton would later study in preparing his Paradise Lost. While Grotius prized these pursuits more highly than the mundane work of a lawyer, he always strove to please his patrons and clients. Indeed, his most lasting contributions to political thought took shape in the course of his professional duties during this period.

In 1604, Grotius was drawn into the sensational controversy over privateering in the Southeast Asian trade. The United Dutch East India Company had been rising quickly as a major player in European overseas commerce, and Grotius shared the view of many of his associates involved in the trade that the Company not only buoyed up the young republic with wealth but also weakened its adversaries by cutting into Iberian dominance of the East Indian routes. Still, acts of piracy by a private concern did not sit well in the public opinion of many citizens and allies. When asked by a friend with Company connections to write a brief justifying a recent and very lucrative seizure of Spanish cargo, Grotius went on to produce not only an ardent defense of the capture but an investigation into the deep principles of law that connected those separated by nation and culture. The resulting manuscript, provisionally titled De Indis (On the Indies), was never published in full until long after Grotius’ death (appearing in 1868 as Commentary on the Laws of Prize and Booty). It was the young jurist’s first systematic work on the problems of international affairs and was in many ways his most philosophically developed. Many of the arguments worked out in the manuscript—that there is a basic law of nature determined by the need to reconcile self-preservation with social life, that the authority to govern and even to punish derive from the rights of natural persons prior to the founding of civil societies, and that claims to jurisdiction over the open seas are invalid—would give direction to his later works.

In fact, the last of these arguments would appear in print in 1609 as the anonymous pamphlet, Mare Liberum (The Free Seas). The pamphlet, which Grotius pulled directly from the text of De Indis, once again served the interests of those in the Dutch political and commercial establishment that were insisting upon the right of access to overseas routes in the ongoing negotiations for a truce with the Spanish. The work argued not only that the Spanish claims to a trading monopoly in the Southeast Asia and elsewhere failed to square with the facts—that these were rights conferred by papal authority or acquired by just conquest—but that there was, in principle, no basis for any monopoly on access to the seas. The freedom of the seas was entailed by the very nature of private property. To privately own a thing requires that one can occupy it, taking it out of the common store, and that one can make full use of it. The sea cannot be contained and is too plentiful for its usefulness to be exhausted by a few; hence, no one can take exclusive ownership of the sea. The seas remain open to all. This question was of great importance in European relations during this period of intense competition between aspiring overseas empires, and Grotius’ work would frame the intense debate to follow. During this time in his early legal career, he penned a number of other manuscripts touching on matters of international relations that, while mostly unpublished, shaped his later work on the subject. The Parellelon Rerumpublicarum (composed 1601-2) explored the concept of ‘good faith’ in dealings with other nations through some flattering comparisons among the customs of the Greek, Roman and Dutch peoples. In his Commentary on Eleven Theses (circa 1602-08), Grotius worked out an understanding of the ruling power of a state—its sovereignty—and its relation to the principles of just war.

Having proved the usefulness of his talents to the ruling elite, Grotius’ star continued to rise. He gained recognition from Prince Maurits of Orange, the executive and military leader of the United Provinces, when in 1607, the prince appointed him as attorney general of the provinces of Holland, Zeeland and West Friesland. It was during this time that he became engaged to be married to a young woman from a distinguished family in Zeeland, Maria van Reigersberch. Her partnership and personal courage would carry the family through a tumultuous life that the young couple could not have expected at the time of their wedding in 1608. Soon thereafter, Maria gave birth to the first of seven children. As his focus shifted from legal practice to public service, Grotius began to put a number of his writings into press. His second celebrated tragedy, The Passion of Christ, came out in 1608, followed by the anonymous Mare Liberum in 1609 and a political history of the old Dutch republic, De Antiquitate Reipublicae Batavicae, in 1610. The historical account provided ideological leverage for the position that Holland had persisted in its republican form of government despite the princely claims of the Hapsburgs. The governing States of Holland commissioned Grotius to write a detailed history of the conflict with Spain, which he submitted in 1612. The States declined, likely due to the delicate truce, to publicize the work, leaving the Annales et Historiae de Rebus Belgicus to rest until his sons brought it out posthumously in 1657. Opportunity for higher office came again when, in 1612, the town council of Rotterdam offered Grotius the mayoral position of Pensionary. The title brought with it a seat in the States of Holland where he would collaborate more closely with his mentor, Oldenbarnevelt, and key players in provincial and national politics.

The political controversy that would end up defining Grotius’ tenure in office began with small rumblings when, in 1608, the professor of theology at the University of Leiden, Jacob Arminius, put forth a doctrine that challenged key features of the reigning Calvinist orthodoxy concerning predestination (see below: Irenicism and Tolerance). Calvinist church officials and divines came out strongly against the preaching of such a view. Though Arminius died the following year, the conflict escalated in a way that pitted the church establishment against the civil authorities over the question of who could rule on such doctrinal disputes. Grotius shared with many in the government of Holland some sympathies with the Arminian view but a desire above all to prevent such matters from disturbing the peace. He had been composing, during this time, a manuscript on the idea that all faiths shared a set of core doctrines, a viewpoint capable of promoting a certain equanimity towards squabbles over the finer points of theology. This was in any case the political attitude Grotius favored, and while he never published the Meletius manuscript, he developed several writings on the role of the state in managing conflicts over religion. The pamphlet, Ordinum Hollandiae et Westfrisiae pietas (1613), defended the ‘piety’ of the governments of Holland and Westfriesland in imposing a policy of toleration that allowed Arminians to preach their dissenting doctrine. Grotius himself had drafted the policy, which failed in its aim of mollifying the factions and, in fact, heightened the conflict between the civil and ecclesiastical authorities. Convinced that the practice of religion was a concern proper to civil magistrates, Grotius set about justifying his views in a longer treatise. De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa Sacra argued that, to avoid a conflict of rights, there must be only one final authority within a state on how religion is to be practiced, that because of its mandate to keep civil peace and form responsible citizens this authority ought to come under the civil power, and that civil magistrates would do well to limit their judgments to the core doctrines Grotius had worked out in Meletius. He developed, though never published, the manuscript of De Imperio as the political conflict continued to escalate during 1614-17. His sympathies with the Arminian theology also grew during this period, and in 1617 he took it upon himself to brush back the charges of heresy with the publication of a theological work, Defensio Fidei Catholicae de Satisfactione Christi adversus Faustum Socinum.

As Grotius was being drawn further into the controversy, it came to consume national politics. The orthodox Calvinists, who were a majority at the national level and now had the backing of Prince Maurits, were demanding a national synod to settle the matter. This set up a standoff between Maurits, the national executive and commander of the armed forces, and Oldenbarnevelt, the most influential figure in the States assembly. Oldenbarnevelt led the elites of Holland, including Grotius, in blocking the synod and managing the dispute at the provincial level. That policy culminated in a decision, when riots broke out in 1617, to authorize local militias to suppress the disorder. Maurits denounced the act as an offense against his military authority, and he seized the opportunity to turn the tide against his political adversaries. At the end of an extended political and military campaign to push the Arminian supporters out of the establishment, he ordered the arrest of Oldenbarnevelt and his key supporters in August 1618. Grotius, with his mentor, was locked up and set for trial. A national synod, the famous Synod of Dort, was scheduled. Though incensed at the military coup d’etat against the sovereign institutions of Holland, Grotius calmly petitioned Maurits and the national States-General to no effect. The trials commenced the following year, and Grotius saw his mentor condemned to death for high treason. On May 18, 1619, his own sentence came down: confiscation of property and life imprisonment.

Although he would strive for the rest of his life to vindicate himself and lift the disgrace of the charges from himself and his family, Grotius entered at the age of thirty-six into his term of imprisonment in the castle Loevestein. The only solace of his confinement was that his family was allowed to reside with him and that on her regular leaves his wife Maria was able to bring back books and papers. The scholar was able to turn his isolation to some greater purpose. In Loevestein, Grotius renewed a number of neglected projects. He wrote, fully in didactic verse, a more systematic treatment of his view that there are essential elements common to all religions and that the doctrines of Christianity were recognizable through reason as the most consistent and highest expression of the common faith. The work, initially composed in Dutch, would serve as the basis for his renowned De Veritate Religionis Christiane (The Truth of the Christian Religion). Through his work in law and legal history, he had conceived the plan of writing a rigorous guidebook on jurisprudence of Holland in the vernacular of the Dutch language. The later publication, in 1631, of Inleidinge to the Hollandsche Rechts-geleerdheid (Introduction the Jurisprudence of Holland) would eventually give his book a status in Dutch law analogous to Blackstone’s Commentaries in the English system. Grotius was convinced that he could achieve the same kind of ordered treatment of the concepts, principles and precedents governing relations at the international level. Closed within the walls of his cell, he reached out for a global view of human affairs and prepared parts of what would become the massive treatise, De Jure Belli ac Pacis (The Rights of War and Peace). At the same time, Grotius was looking beyond the walls of Loevestein with a mind for a more immediate scheme: escape. He knew that he had support in the court of Louis XIII in France, and his hopes for reestablishing himself pointed towards Paris. Maria and the family’s young maid-servant, Elsje van Houwening, hatched the plan for escape. On March 22, 1621, Maria made arrangements for a chest of books to be shipped to the nearby town of Gorcum, then helped her husband into the cramped chest and watched Elsje accompany the guards as they unwittingly delivered their prisoner into the hands of friends. A month later, Grotius was in Paris, separated from his family, exiled from his beloved country, yet free.

The long period Grotius spent in exile saw the publication of his most remembered works. Having secured the support of Louis XIII and being reunited with his family, he prepared several manuscripts that he hoped would restore him to prominence. The Apologeticus, appearing in 1622, was straight to the purpose: it contained a full defense of his conduct as a public official of Holland. Despite his earnest pleas of loyalty and the best efforts of his friends, the States-General spurned his arguments and authorized a bounty on him. He turned his attention to the scholarly projects begun in Loevestein. The treatise on the universal law of nature and nations, divided into three hefty books, grew out of the reflections on the subject he had begun twenty years prior. Its first book developed an account of natural justice, so central to his earlier arguments about the Southeast Asian trade, and laid out a broad framework for judging “controversies of any and every kind, as are likely to arise” (JBP I.I.i)—those among politically sovereign entities, private parties, or rival camps within a state. The lengthy second book provided a grounding for the rights in one’s person, property, and sovereignty (subjects he was revisiting from Mare Liberum and his unpublished commentaries) and a detailed consideration of the ways such rights could be acquired, transferred, lost, and protected by recourse to war. The third book, dramatizing the gap between the prevailing customs of warfare and the demands placed on us by a more humane conscience, considers what responsibilities parties have to all those they impact in wartime and in upholding good faith in efforts to build the peace. Many of the arguments of the work were forged in Grotius’ career as an advocate and public official, though he insists in the Prolegomena to the treatise that his perspective in the work is that of a mathematician, abstracting away from particular facts and controversies of the day. When the first edition of De Jure Belli ac Pacis made its appearance in 1625, its readers would have no shortage of conflicts to which to apply its ideas about war and peace, from the campaigns of conquest and appropriation overseas to the long-raging religious conflicts on the continent that were escalating into what would be the Thirty Years War.

Grotius continued, while in France, to write and visit scholars. His Latin edition of The Truth of Christian Religion came out in 1627. It would become his most widely read and translated work. Despite the unreliability of his pension from King Louis, he turned down some tempting offers to serve as a diplomat for other nations and instead renewed his efforts to rehabilitate his standing in the Netherlands. Upon the death of Prince Maurits, Grotius returned to Holland in 1631 in hopes of finding favor with the new Prince of Orange, Frederick Henry, but an arrest warrant from the States-General forced him to flee and take up refuge in Hamburg. Grotius and his wife remained for more than two years in the city without any great prospects. He set himself to composing a third major tragedy, Sophompaneas (Joseph), which would appear in 1635. By that time, his work on the laws of war had brought opportunity to his doorstep. In 1634, he was called to meet with the Swedish High Chancellor, Oxenstierna, who informed him that the recently slain King Gustavus Adolphus had been a great admirer of De Jure Belli and expressed a desire to bring Grotius into the service of Sweden. A major power, Sweden had risen up as a champion of the Protestant cause in the bloody war that gripped Europe, and Grotius was asked to provide counsel to the young queen and serve as her ambassador to another key power, France. The position required that he renounce his Dutch citizenship in order to declare his loyalty to the Swedish crown. Though he never let go of the hope of returning to his home, he accepted. The de Groot family would once again take up residence in Paris.

As ambassador, Grotius was charged with negotiating the terms of French support for the Protestant alliance. The relations were especially fraught due to the delicate position that the French crown, under the guidance of Cardinal Richelieu, had carved out between its opposition to Hapsburg power and its defense of Catholicism. As France increasingly entered the battle fray, much of Grotius’ duty was directed to the war effort. His scholarly projects from the late 1630s-40s, however, took as their object a long-cherished goal: the reconciliation and peace of the Christian community. He began in 1638 on a scriptural commentary that would deflate Protestant rhetoric charging that the Pope was the Antichrist. That same year he slipped an anonymous treatise through an Amsterdam press defending the lay administration of the Eucharist. He then released two lengthy collections of annotations, one on the New Testament and one on the Old, which emphasized the ethical role of the scriptures over the more divisive questions of theology. Building on the idea of shared core doctrines he had explored in his earlier manuscripts, he frankly promoted his vision for a reconciled faith in an appeal printed in Paris in 1942, Via ad Pacem Ecclesiasticam (The Way to Church Peace). Grotius had great hopes that the time was ripe for this vision, but he was disappointed when his arguments were swallowed up in the same old sectarian vitriol.

Having passed the age of sixty, Grotius met with some relief his recall to Swedish court in 1645. The Queen offered to settle his family in Sweden, but he instead requested a passport so that he could rejoin Maria and pursue opportunities elsewhere. He embarked in August in the midst of a terrible storm that damaged the ship and washed it upon the German coast. The ordeal left him ill and weather-beaten. With the aid of servants, he made it to the town of Rostock where he found a hospice. His condition worsened, and death came on August 28, 1645. Arrangements were made to convey his remains to Delft, where the town of his birth bestowed him with the honor that he could not regain in life by interring his body in the Nieuwe Kerk alongside the most celebrated figures of the republic. Maria resettled in Holland, and their sons set about preparing, from Grotius’ papers, updated editions and previously unpublished manuscripts for the press. De Jure Belli ac Pacis, especially, would come to have enduring influence as the Enlightenment philosophers of the next generations embraced its framework of natural jurisprudence as a model for a modern science of law and morals. His work would become a point of departure for those natural lawyers focusing on the law among nations, from Pufendorf and Barbeyrac to Thomasius and Vattel. It would inspire radical ideas about natural rights and the social contract in the Anglo-American political discourses of Hobbes, Locke, Jefferson and Madison. For the Scottish Enlightenment, it would be required reading, informing the moral theories of Carmichael, Hutcheson, Hume and Smith. As natural jurisprudence gave way to positivism and idealism in 19th-century European thought, the place of Grotius receded in moral and political theory, but his work would be recovered in the context of emerging ideas about the international legal order as the next century approached. His work is most widely known today among those working on international relations and law, though there has been rapidly expanding scholarship on his contributions to political thought, ethics, and the philosophy of religion.

2. Irenicism and Tolerance

In the politics of the Dutch Republic and with regard to the broader religious strife in Europe, Grotius fashioned himself as an irenicist, one who seeks to bring the different denominations of Christianity together. The inflammatory conflicts among the Christian churches, which remained a persistent cause of war and upheaval in the political life of European societies, was in Grotius’ view largely attributable to excesses of dogmatism (see Heering 2004). If dogmatic claims could be reduced to an agreeable set of core tenets, he reasoned, then the various sects would have grounds for cooperating towards a reunified Christian church while allowing more esoteric matters to be contested without posing a threat to peace. This hope for Christian peace and unity characterizes Grotius’ theologically-oriented works from his early Meletius (1611) to Via ad Pacem Ecclesiasticam (1642), among his latest writings at the height of the Thirty Years War.

a. Religion and Civil Authority

In the early decades of the 17th century when Grotius’ was cutting his teeth in Dutch politics, the temperature was rising on a theological dispute concerning salvation and freedom of the will. The reformed churches, which had the backing of the civil authorities, were founded on orthodox Calvinist doctrine. The standard Calvinist view of salvation held that God’s choice of who would be saved preceded the act of creation; this grace was, consequently, not a status that could be earned through good works but rather was predestined. This view was consistent with the dominant Protestant interpretations of scripture and represented a social and ethical worldview that was compelling to the reformed faithful. Yet this view also carried the ethically troubling implication that individual choice makes no difference to how one stands with God and, as the Leiden professor of theology, Jacob Arminius, would argue, did not account for elements of scripture that seemed to acknowledge a role for human will. Arminius maintained that God’s saving grace was on offer to anyone while still accepting the basic Calvinist premise that, prior to any human act, God had already determined who He would actually elect to everlasting happiness. The paradox could be resolved by recognizing that God’s grace might be resisted. This elegant solution enabled Arminius to account for freedom of the human will while retaining the key Protestant tenet that grace alone, not works, qualifies the elect. The Arminian view of salvation, to draw on Richard Tuck’s illuminating analogy, understands God’s offer of grace to the elect to be much like a parent’s offer to buy something for a child: “the child can refuse the offer, but he cannot purchase the present himself” (Tuck 1993 p. 182). While representing a significant revision to orthodox Calvinism, this view remained consistent with the larger doctrine.

The political question, however, was whether adherents of the Arminian position should be allowed to teach it within the publically established churches. Grotius’ writings from this period confront both the theological and political aspects of the debate. On the question of theology his sympathies laid with Arminius, and his defenses of the view led up to the publication of the substantial De Satisfactione (published in 1617), which distinguished many of the Arminian tenets from the ‘Socianian’ heresies charged by the view’s opponents. Politically, the Arminian preachers were seeking a policy of toleration within the public churches. Grotius and others aligned with Oldenbarnevelt recognized the advantages of such a policy for preserving quiet in the republic. Characteristically, Grotius saw the policy as rooted in philosophical concerns. As early as the (unpublished) manuscript Meletius (1611), he was developing a philosophy of religion according to which all faiths shared core beliefs about the nature of divinity and its role in human life. While this view stressed commonality, it did not entail pluralism. A religious tradition may possess a stronger claim to truth than others in virtue of its consistency with the central doctrines and the credibility of its supporting testimony; for Grotius, Christianity held this title. (This defense of Christianity is most fully developed in Grotius’ most widely published and popular work, On the Truth of the Christian Religion.) Yet Christian tradition, too, had a further set of core doctrines which were necessary for proper worship and for the promotion of responsible citizenship. The church could accommodate friendly debate over finer matters of theology as long as it was firmly rooted in the necessary articles of faith. This philosophical framework, while not made fully public at the time, undergirded Grotius’ advocacy of the toleration policy, which the States of Holland would eventually adopt.

The policy, Grotius well understood, required not only justification but also legitimacy: in defining acceptable doctrines, the civil authority was asserting itself in sacred matters. Grotius addressed this issue in his 1613 pamphlet defending the toleration policy, Ordinum Hollandiae et Westfrisiae pietas, and went on to develop the argument for the central principles into a major essay on the authority of civil government over the public practice of religion. De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa sacra (1614-17, unpublished) argued that the supreme civil power holds legitimate authority over all matters concerning the public interest, whether sacred or profane. In addition to finding support from scripture and tradition, Grotius grounds his case on the simple Aristotelian argument that, because the commands of multiple authorities would allow for conflicting obligations, there can be only one supreme authority in a jurisdiction (ch. 1). Holding this authority enables the supreme power, then, to preserve civil peace as well as to promote, through the effects of religion, the formation of obedient and upright citizens. The bulk of the work is thus occupied with defending the plausibility of this conclusion by clearing away misconceptions and by reconciling it both with the variety of forms of political and legal organization and with the special calling of the church. To accept the authority of the civil power in religious matters, Grotius argues, does not imply that magistrates are competent to determine the truth of all fine points of theology: a wise ruler will make use of counsel from the most reliable pastors. With even greater wisdom, a ruler would do well to abstain from pronouncing on all but the most essential articles of faith, those that are necessary for salvation (ch. 6, 9). As an instance of an inessential matter in which a “prudent silence” recommends itself, he offers those “questions about the order of predestination and the reconciliation of human free will with grace” (ibid). The policy of the States of Holland, in this framework, was a form of containment: the policy defined the boundaries of permissible doctrine at the point that would endanger the salvation of those who accept it, while allowing the disagreements inside these bounds to play themselves out. Such was Grotius’ recommendation, in both theory and practice. At bottom, however, the policy had its validity not in view of its laudable tolerance but on Erastian grounds. (The citations in the work acknowledge the influence of Thomas Erastus, who a generation earlier had argued for the supreme authority of the state in church governance.) The central position of De imperio was that any policy issued by the civil power would be valid so long as it did not contradict God’s will. That this Erastian position made room for toleration and contributed to civil peace only added to its appeal.

b. Relations with Non-Christians

The principle of toleration guided Grotius’ handling of the Arminian conflict and also served as an ideal in his view of dealings with non-Christians. Among the groups that had found haven in the Netherlands from the Inquisition were Portuguese Jews, and Grotius was asked during his time as a public official to reconsider what ought to be the policy the States towards the presence and worship practices of Jewish communities. His Remonstrantie on the question was of a piece with his developing philosophy of public religion: Jewish worship could be consistent with the state interest in religion, as Judaism accepted the fundamental doctrines regarding God’s existence and concern for human conduct. The policy recommendation was to afford civil liberties and freedom of worship to Jews, under certain restrictions that would serve to “safeguard” the salvation of Christians. This meant, for instance, that Jewish synagogues would not enjoy the same freedom to preach to Christian audiences that could be granted to Arminian and Calvinist disputants, but Grotius maintained that this encumbered status was preferable to the other options in the field. He opposed forcing Jews to practice Christianity on the grounds that such a policy was incoherent, since faith cannot be forced, as well as sinful, since it would induce people to false professions. An alternative was to forbid Jewish worship altogether, but this would promote godlessness, which would be intolerable. Finally, to those who were calling for expulsion, Grotius gave a sustained response partly grounded in principles of natural law: the social bond that nature establishes among humans should not be severed except as punishment for crime. Jewish practice did not transgress natural law, and its faith supported civic life. It was proper, therefore, that Christians and Jews share social arrangements on the basis of common principles of public order and justice.

The same balance between Christian privilege and the potential for peaceful cooperation underwrote Grotius’ approach towards the expanding relationships between Europeans and non-Christian societies around the world. The principles of natural justice in De Jure Belli ac pacis—which grounded claims to sovereignty, property, and the fulfillment of pacts—were valid and binding in any human encounter, requiring no special relation to God. The principles would oblige us, in Grotius’ famous phrase, “even if we should concede (etiamsi daremus) that which cannot be conceded without the utmost wickedness, that there is no God, or that the affairs of men are of no concern to Him” (JBP Prol. 11). Mutual recognition of natural law provided the basis for any two parties to arrive at just and peaceful terms of association, most notably those concerning trade and alliances. This did not imply that all practices regarding religion were consistent with natural law. Because a sense of justice is not sufficient to motivate humans routinely to do right, the broader human society, even more than civil societies, depends upon religion to maintain order and instill reverence for its norms (see JBP Prol. 20 and II.XX.XLIV.6). To reject God involves not only the “utmost wickedness” but a criminal disregard for human society. Indeed, the two tenets that Grotius identifies—that there is a God and that human affairs are of concern to Him—constitute what he takes to be the core of religious belief, found in all societies. Those who oppose these core beliefs may be punished, by war if necessary, but differences among the religious are not, in themselves, grounds for war (JBP II.XX.XLVI-XLVIII). Pagans, polytheists, Jews and Muslims might fail to accept the “truths” of Christianity, but their participation in the common faith supports the basic ethical structure of society. Christianity, even under non-Christian sovereigns, yet has this privilege: that in virtue of its claim to truth, its adherents must not be punished for teaching the Gospel (JBP II.XX.XLIX). The right to suppress religious doctrine, which De imperio claimed for the civil power, extends only to teachings not essential to Christian salvation.

c. Christian Unity and Peace

The privileged status of Christianity among the world’s religions is the subject of The Truth of the Christian Religion. As in De Jure Belli, composed around the same time, Grotius argues that a basic understanding of divinity and its role in the world is accessible through the use of the natural capacity of reason alone. Such truths include not only the existence and providence of God, but also God’s oneness, perfection, causal responsibility for all that happens, and judgment in the afterlife. The proofs Grotius offers are not original but are borrowed from sources both ancient and recent, owning that people of varying sophistication have long been able to reason back to a necessary and singular ‘first cause’ and to grasp that the perfect nature of such a cause would not neglect the good of all creation (ch. 1).  While some of these points require more subtle thought than others, all people can in principle arrive at the conclusions through rational reflection. Christ, however, is known through history. To learn of redemption and of what is required for salvation, one needs access to particular facts about Christ’s coming and His call to the faithful. The relevant facts, still, are supported by reasonable inferences based on reliable testimony (the evangelists), the consensus of historians, and the evidence of miracles performed. This project of deriving religious knowledge through rational investigation is what later philosophers would call “natural religion.” Significantly, Grotius argues that these facts gain further confirmation when one recognizes that the doctrines of Christianity have the greatest intrinsic appeal. The Gospel has this appeal in virtue of the reward it promises (the eternal beatitude of the soul), the quality of its ethical teachings (obeying out of love rather than fear, showing love to neighbors and enemies, and so forth), and the impeccable character of its teacher, Christ (ch. 2). Experience and rational consideration, while sufficient to establish the truth of Christianity, may not convince as readily as inferences from mere reason. Indeed, immediate acceptance is not possible without God’s help. On these grounds, Grotius would argue in De Jure Belli that one may neither punish those who fail to embrace Christianity nor impose belief by force (II.XX.XLVIII). Christians would do better to impress non-believers with their ethical example and offer persuasive arguments for conversion.

To this end, De Veritate provides a detailed debunking of other faiths. While its arguments reveal that Grotius undertook a serious study of non-Christian religions—with the aid of friends such as the Hebrew and Arabic scholar, Thomas Erpenius—some of his characterizations are far from generous, repeating old slurs about Jewish animosity towards Christians and the violent character of Islam. The arguments of the book were, after all, calculated to more than one purpose. Grotius intended the book to be of special use to seamen, whom while off to many corners of the earth to establish Dutch trading interests, would encounter a dazzling diversity of religious belief that might not only elude their attempts at persuasion but also challenge their own faith. It was the Christian reader, most of all, who may need to be assured of the Gospel’s special claim to truth.

The further effect Grotius hoped De Veritate would have on its Christian readers was to impress upon them that, in the range of religious diversity, the similarities among Christians are much more significant than the differences. The irenicist program that Grotius pursued in his later years had two main prongs. The first provided a map for Christian reunification based upon minimal agreement regarding core doctrines, beyond which some difference of belief and practice could be accommodated. The second urged Christians to recognize that the most important lessons to be taken from scripture are its ethical teachings, not its dogmas. This was the simple, practical faith that he saw reflected in the earliest Christian community and in the Christian humanists, like Erasmus, whom he so much admired. It was also a faith of which civil authorities, responsible for civic peace and virtue, could be worthy custodians.

3. Sovereignty and Imperialism

Connecting the political and international thought of Grotius is his conception of sovereignty, the supreme right of governing (summum imperium). The mark of the sovereign power is that it “cannot be made void by any other human will” (JBP, I.III.viii). Within a state, it is the highest authority; internationally it encounters other sovereign powers, among whom none holds a superior right.

a. Divisible Sovereignty

The guiding idea in Grotius’ treatment of sovereignty, as with his treatment of rights generally, is that systems of rights are radically alterable through the ways people choose to dispose of those rights. As a result, societies will vary widely in how they organize the powers of sovereignty. Philosophers might argue for the advantages of one scheme or another, “but as there are several ways of living, some better than others, and every one may choose which he pleases of all those sorts; so a people may choose what form of government they please: neither is the right which the sovereign has over his subjects to be measured by this or that form, of which divers men have divers opinions, but by the extent of the will of those who conferred it upon him” (JBP I.III.viii). What justifies a scheme of rights is that it has arisen from the historical choices of their legitimate holders, not any features of its form. This principle gave Grotius a great deal of flexibility in defending different political arrangements, provided the facts of history for the given society would play along.

On one side, Grotius was able to argue against royalists who sought to define sovereignty as an indivisible package of prerogatives that could be vested in only a singular will. Grotius takes this claim, which Jean Bodin had advanced a generation earlier, at face value but treats indivisibility as a purely conceptual point: to institute civil power in a society consists in gathering up a certain package of governmental rights and in designating who will hold that power supremely. The rights of governing come as a package, but a society may, if it chooses, designate different holders for the various rights.

Grotius developed this position early in his career in an unpublished manuscript that he called Commentary in Eleven Theses. The practical divisibility of sovereignty is an indispensable premise for the political argument of the work, which defends the ongoing Dutch war against the rule of the king of Spain. Unlike earlier apologists, Grotius does not conceive of the war as a revolt based on right of a people to resist a tyrannical ruler but rather as a war between sovereign powers (see Borschberg 1994 pp. 169ff. and Keene 2002 pp. 45ff.). If one studies the history of rights in the Dutch case, Grotius argues, one finds that the Dutch people did not transfer all governing rights to a prince bur reserved some, in particular the right to levy taxes, to the States of Holland. While holding supreme power on many matters, the Spanish king had sought to usurp a further supreme power from the States, an act which provided them a just cause to wage war in defense of its right. Put in the language of sovereignty, the king possessed no right to render void the will of the States when it came to taxation, just as this particular right of the States could not render void the king’s rights in other matters: each was supreme within the scope of its own authority (cf. JBP I.IV.xiii). Grotius retained and systematized this conception of divisible sovereignty in De Jure Belli, where he also considered the criticism that such arrangements based on divided powers were recipes for civil strife. His answer insists on the principle with which he began: while one can point to inconveniences in any arrangements, the only relevant question in matters of right is whether those arrangements were the ones chosen (I.III.xvii).

On the other side of the political spectrum, Grotius argued against theories of popular sovereignty. The position of constitutionalist thinkers, such as those among the reforming Huguenots who would come to be called ‘monarchomachs,’ was that the right of kings to rule derives from the rights of the people; since some of these rights are inalienable, the representatives of the people retain a right to resist a regime that tyrannically usurps these rights. Grotius’ response was to grant that rights originate from the people but to argue that the people can choose to alienate whatever rights they wish, even up to the extreme of enslaving themselves to another (JBP, I.III.viii). Utter subjection to an absolute monarch is, therefore, entirely possible and consistent with the history of political arrangements in many societies. Grotius’ flexible approach enabled him to defend the republican principles alive in the Dutch provinces from one side of his mouth while shoring up the absolutist claims of his later patrons from the other. In his defense of the latter claims, we find Grotius even paying homage to the time-worn doctrine of Aristotle that some people are naturally suited to be slaves. Importantly, Grotius does not admit the doctrine as grounds for imposing slavery but rather repurposes it: the doctrine can explain why a people might choose of their own accord to hand over their full rights to the more prudent government of another. Ineptitude at self-rule, it turns out, is just one of many considerations that might factor into the selection of a form of government.

b. Resistance, War and Empire

Grotius’ understanding of sovereignty carries several implications for his theory of just war. The first concerns his position on the “right of resistance,” the hotly contested question of whether a subject people may ever justly depose a ruler for misgovernment. While Grotius rejects constitutionalist arguments that reserve inalienable rights to the people, he finds a way to preserve this rationale for resistance in a more limited form. It is unlikely that most civil societies would have been founded on utter subjection. In the absence of clear evidence that subjects have completely alienated their rights, one has to presume that rational people would have preserved their most basic rights against arbitrary treatment. This presumption attaches only in cases of “extreme necessity,” as when a government turns its sword on innocent subjects, and then only when resistance could be carried out without creating an even bloodier civil conflict (I.VI.vii). When Grotius invokes this argument from extreme necessity, he relies on what Richard Tuck has called a kind of interpretive charity (1979 pp. 79-80): since civil authority is a human institution, the bounds of which are derived from the wills of those who established it, one must credit the founders with intentions that would rationally advance, not undermine, the aims of civil association. (Compare the parallel reasoning in limiting the rights of property, Second, Grotius assigns a role in this context to third-party humanitarian intervention. Even if it should turn out that subjects must bear the most arbitrary assaults from their proper sovereign, a third-party would remain free from the special obligations that constrain subjects from resisting and could intervene on their behalf. Such interventions should only be attempted when it is evident that a government is committing gross injustices against its people—“such Tyrannies over subjects, as no good Man living can approve” (JBP II.XXV.viii). The third implication concerns Grotius’ complicated relation to imperialism. In defending the legitimacy of diverse forms of political authority, he is rejecting the principle behind those forms of imperialism that seek to impose a more enlightened form of rule for the good of the governed. Elsewhere in De Jure Belli he explicitly refutes the argument that slavery can be imposed on those who might be naturally suited to it (II.XXII.xii) and castigates those who claim rights of ‘discovery’ over lands already occupied by supposedly less enlightened folk (II.XXII.ix). On these points, he is in agreement with earlier critics of the Spanish conquests such as Francisco de Vitoria and Bartolome de las Casas.

The strategies of commercial imperialism, which characterized Dutch practice, found much more support in Grotius’ theory of just war (see generally, Tuck 1999 ch. 3, van Ittersum 2006, Wilson 2008, Thomson 2009). The whole concern of De Jure Belli is how to justly settle controversies in the dealings of those who do not live under a shared system of civil laws. In the context of global trade, such dealings will involve the claims of private parties as well as the contentions of kings and states. It ultimately falls to each party, when operating outside the jurisdiction of a common court, to judge the controversy based on the applicable standards of natural, customary, state and divine law. Significantly, Grotius maintains that such relations can be peaceful so long as those involved have a clear understanding of the law and hold themselves to norms of justice, equity, temperance, and humanity. Yet, just as magistrates duly back their rulings with force, those involved in a dispute have the right to redress injuries by means of war. Used rightly, De Jure Belli would provide all parties with a clear understanding of how the law applied to various disputes and educate them in how to render fair and responsible verdicts. However, used rightly, it would also give trading powers the flexibility to leverage their arrangements with non-Europeans and the justifications to uphold these arrangements with force. One stratagem it enabled was encroachment on local sovereignty (see Keene 2002 pp. 48ff and 79ff). Grotius’ position was firmly that non-Christian rulers could hold full title to sovereignty, but his view of sovereignty was that its marks could be divided up among various holders. A foreign trading power might enter into an alliance with a ruler that required him, for instance, to provide land for a trading ‘factory’ or deliver up his people’s labor. These arrangements do not, in themselves, transfer any mark of sovereignty, but Grotius argues that, if the foreign power (unjustly) usurps this right over time without being challenged, its “long possession” provides it with a claim to sovereignty that is now just (JBP I.III.XXI.10-11). Because marks of sovereignty can be divided off in this way, the foreign power can take over limited rights of its own without being guilty of usurping the broader authority of the king. Once the limited right was established, however, it could also be protected with force should the king try to reconsolidate his power (by the same right that the Dutch defended their limited sovereignty against the ambitions of their Spanish overlord). Had the rulers of Southeast Asia read Grotius’ work, they might have found a useful warning about the risks of getting entangled with a powerful ally; the readers among the European mercantile class would also see its usefulness.

The natural-right framework of De Jure Belli also empowers parties to a contract to arrive at their own judgments about how to interpret indeterminate clauses (JBP II.XVI) and authorizes any party, public or private, to execute punishment for culpable violations of the law (II.XX). The idea that war-making can be understood as an extension of the right to punish had been part of the Christian just-war tradition from Augustine through Vitoria and Suarez, but Grotius reconceives punishment as a natural right that obtains prior to civil authority (see Tuck 1999 pp. 102f. and Straumann 2006). In circumstances beyond civil jurisdiction, law-respecting persons can take it upon themselves to police and punish crimes affecting society. Because this exercise of power over another assumes a position of superiority, Grotius recognizes the need to explain how this difference in standing can arise among those who are equal by nature. His solution is to point out that violators demote themselves beneath the rest of humanity (JBP II.XX.iii). Anyone who remains in this position of moral superiority can properly execute punishment. The natural right to punish was an important innovation in Grotius’ early De Indis, where he argued that Dutch merchants had legitimate authority to punish the Portuguese for monopolizing the seas (fol. 40). It remains a key feature of his theory of punishment in De Jure Belli, where it provides a further source for just causes to resort to war. In contrast to the anti-imperialist arguments of Vitoria and the school of Salamanca, which had maintained that the princes of Europe had no authority to punish those beyond their jurisdiction except in response to ‘an injury received’ (On the Law of War q.1 a.3; see also On the American Indians q. 2 a.5), Grotius opens the door to punitive war against those who commit ‘crimes against nature.’ Elevated as moral superiors above regimes that enjoin or condone manifestly unjust practices—including cannibalism, piracy, the oppression of their own people or the cruel treatment of foreigners—outside powers may seek to punish these regimes in the interests of human society (II.XX.XL). Adopted while Grotius still had ties to the interests of the Dutch trading companies, this interventionist stance would have expanded the range of justifications available for colonizing lands in both Asia and the Americas (see Tuck 1999 pp. 103-4 and van Ittersum 2010).

At the same time, Grotius shows an awareness, and some discomfort, that his position could be used as a pretext for expansionist wars. He cautions that only violations of universal norms, not of the evolving customs of Europe, count as punishable offenses. Quoting Plutarch, he explicitly warns of the lurking temptations of imperialism: “To wish to impose civilization upon uncivilized peoples is a pretext which may serve to conceal greed for what is another’s” (II.XX.XLI). The structure of Grotius’ position, characteristic of the framework of De Jure Belli, both insists on strict adherence to norms of justice, equity and humanity while still affording the powerful the flexibility to interpret, judge and enforce those norms by their own lights.

4. Natural Right and the Law of Nations

The broadest principles of just war in De Jure Belli ac pacis derive from two sources: the norms of natural justice and the customary law of nations (ius gentium). (Other human and divine laws, importantly, also lay down binding principles for those who have received them, but these sources do not have the universal character of the laws of nature and nations.) On any given question regarding the resort to war or its conduct, both systems of law must be consulted, as each system is capable of influencing the rights and obligations of the other.

a. Obligations from Nature and Custom

The account of natural law in De Jure Belli, heavily influenced by the Stoic notions of Cicero, begins from two universal human concerns: self-preservation and social connection (see JBP I.II.I and Prol. 6-8). The rights of obligations of natural law are all justified in terms of the rational balancing of these two primary concerns. This approach is an outgrowth of Grotius’ earliest work on the laws of war, De Indis, where he argued that the imperative of self-preservation justified two permissions of natural law: to defend one’s life and to acquire possessions (fol. 5’-6). The need for human fellowship justifies two basic obligations towards others: to refrain from inflicting injury and from seizing their possessions (fol. 6’-7’). One apparent change that Grotius makes to his earlier theory regards the basis for these obligations. In De Indis, he aligns himself with a voluntarist account of obligation, found in medieval thinkers such as Ockham, which maintains that natural law is binding upon humans in virtue of the divine will that commands it (fol 5’). The design of nature is one way in which we receive God’s commands. By the time of De Jure Belli, Grotius seems to accept the alternative, intellectualist position that natural law binds us by teaching what both humans and God can recognize as necessary for human life: it shows us not what is obligatory because commanded but what is obligatory or permissible “in itself” (JBP I.I.x). In fact, there is much ambiguity in the later work as to which position Grotius accepts, showing itself even in his very definition of natural law as “a dictate of right reason, which points out that an act has in it a quality of moral baseness of moral necessity; and that, in consequence, such an act is either forbidden or enjoined by the author of nature, God” (JBP I.I.x). This definition is perhaps closest to the ‘mediating’ position more recently advanced by Suárez, maintaining that intellect could recognize what is, in itself, good or bad for humans but that only God’s command makes it obligatory to live accordingly (De Legibus II.VI; see Schneewind 1998 pp. 61 and 74).

What is clear is that Grotius draws a basic distinction in law, following Aristotle, between obligations derived from nature and those derived from an authoritative will (JBP I.I.ix and xiii-xvi). Sources of this second, ‘volitional’ type of law can be divine (as revealed in scripture) or human, and the latter includes not only the laws of particular states but also those laws that nations accept in their relations with each other. Kings and peoples give their assent to the law of nations through custom, not typically by positive agreement. Long observance of a norm in the relations between states gives it the force of law. In contrast to natural law, which confers its basic rights and obligations to all persons whether in a private or public capacity, the law of nations applies to relations between sovereign entities (cf. JBP Prol. 40; De Indis fol. 12ff). It deals, accordingly, largely with matters of state, such as embassies, treaties, and the special privileges of sovereigns in waging war. This system of customary law, in turns out, makes the legal position of sovereigns radically different from that of private actors in the ‘universal society’ established by natural law.

b. Just War: Jus ad Bellum

The mutual influence of the laws of nature and nations can be seen in both the resort to war (traditionally called the jus ad bellum) and in its conduct (jus in bello). The only just grounds for resorting to war are those that involve the pursuit of a right. Among such pursuits, Grotius identifies three kinds: self-defense, the recovery of property and punishment. Each of these has its basis in natural law, though the particular rights at issue might arise from other sources, such as the law of nations. The right of self-defense arises from the natural permission every person has to protect against injury (II.I.iii). If our primary concern is self-preservation, we could not take the risk of living among other people without reserving the permission to protect ourselves from them. The right of defense extends not only to one’s life, but also to one’s body and property. Grotius argues that killing in defense of one’s body is justifiable even if the assailant’s objective is not to kill but to maim or rape ( The reason is that one can never trust that a physical assault will not result in death (though it is unclear in Grotius’ treatment of rape whether it is the victim’s life or interests of men in her ‘chastity’ that is the justifying concern). There are two constraints on justified self-defense: that the attack is imminent and certain (II.I.v). Defense is a just cause that applies only to immediate danger. Even property, however, may be defended with lethal force, with the further constraint that such force is necessary for retaining it (II.I.xvi).

Apart from defense, war may be waged in order to recover one’s rights or to punish the offender. Acting under these just causes will often entail being the one to initiate violence. Grotius argues that this breach of peace is not anti-social (and hence in violation of natural justice) because the initiator is only demanding what the other party already owes (I.II.i.5-6) – they are not violating but upholding the system of rights. Recovery of property applies not only to moveable things and territory, but also to rights over persons (such as rightful subjects or slaves), rights to actions (such as the fulfillment of contracts), and compensation for damages. All of these might be claimed by natural right, though the particular claims might be shaped by prevailing domestic systems of property or by the law of nations. This single heading yields an expansive range of cases in which war is a just option for enforcing rights. Punishment multiplies such cases. When someone willfully violates a right, they become obligated not only to make restitution but to endure punishment equivalent to their crime. Any law-respecting person (as explained above) may execute this punishment, in principle, though a number of factors will tend to limit international punishment. Due to the high risk of harming the innocent in pursuit of the guilty, punitive wars are permissible only for serious crimes (II.XX.xxxviii). In most circumstances, only sovereign governments will be permitted to execute the punishment since individual citizens would have transferred this natural right to their state (see II.XX.xxiv and II.XX.xl; cf. De Indis, fol. 40-40’). Public authorities, therefore, can lay claim to special punitive causes such as the punishment of crimes against natural society (see above) and anticipatory defense. Whereas only an actual attack can justify self-defense, a plot to attack, once set in motion, is already a crime (II.I.xvi). Under the cause of punishment, a state may resort to preemptive warfare which defense alone could not justify. Finally, every exercise of punishment must be limited to the achievement of certain goods. While the right to punish has a retributive justification rooted in the offender’s obligation to endure it, the exercise of this right ought to be governed by consequentialist considerations. The good of the offender, of the victim and of the broader society, are all relevant benefits that need to be weighed against the harms to each of these (II.XX.iv-ix). Especially when the consequences of punishment include a broader war, these considerations may urge clemency, restraint or even pardon (II.XX.xxii-iv and xxxiv-xxxvi; see II.XXIV.ii-iii).

There is a general pattern of argument—that people are permitted, in the strictness of justice, to use violence in a great many cases that will nonetheless call for moderation in the name of humanity and peace—that characterizes the whole of De Jure Belli ac Pacis. Justice is a crucial virtue, as the maintenance of society and respect of law require it, but its guidance is limited to these minimal aims. To know what the laws ought to be and to decide when and how far to exercise one’s rights, it becomes necessary to follow the promptings of equity, humanity and prudence. These “virtues which have as their object the good of others” (I.I.viii) not only serve to measure the proper severity of punishments but also to determine whether war for a punitive cause is warranted at all. Humaneness imposes a moral limit, too, in how far one ought to press rights to property, so as not to use market power to squeeze people (II.XII.xvi) or to withhold vital information when making contracts (II.XII.ix). Even in self-defense, the resort to war can have humanitarian consequences that speak strongly against making full use of one’s right (II.I.iv, viii, ix and xi). It would be a grave error, Grotius warns, to think that “where a right has been adequately established, either war should be waged forthwith, or even that war is permissible in all cases” (II.XXIV.i). The resort to war must be squared not only with justice but with humanitarian concerns, especially for its impact on the lives of innocent people. This loving regard for others that aspires to universality is what Grotius held up, in his works on religion, as the great ethical appeal of the Gospel, and De Jure Belli instructs its readers to recognize that not only humanity but also God calls them to love, forbearance and restraint.

c. Just War: Jus in Bello

The meshing of these normative standards of justice and humanity is especially pronounced in Grotius’ treatment of the conduct of war in Book III of De Jure Belli. The natural law provides but one basic rule for the conduct of war: “things which lead to an end receive their intrinsic value from the end itself” (JBP III.I.ii). That is, if one has a right to resort to war, then one has a right to conduct the war by whatever means are necessary to vindicate the just case. Grotius finds natural justice an unsatisfactory basis for the ethics of combat for two main reasons: (i) it permits inhumane and intemperate actions on the part of those who fight under a just cause, and (ii) it provides no guidance whatsoever for those who fight under an unjust cause. The answer to the first deficiency is Grotius’ account of temperamenta, discussed below. The second deficiency finds its solution in the law of nations. Grotius recognizes that while no war can be naturally just on both sides—a right on one side precludes a right on the other—wars may be either unjust on both sides or justifiably believed to be just on both sides. In either case, there are belligerents for whom natural justice provides no guidance other than, ‘your cause is unjust: stop fighting.’ Grotius resigns himself to the realism that, aside from exceptional cases, most states will not admit to the injustice of their cause and simply stop fighting. The longer such states fight, the more injustices they pile up by resisting the just party. Before long there would be no limit to the punitive war that could be prosecuted against the unjust state (see III.IV.iv). Grotius suggests that nations, recognizing the perils of this situation, established a custom of holding both parties in a war to have equal standing on the battlefield. That is, the law of nations permits to both sides (regardless of the justice of their cause) all the actions that the natural law would permit to the just.

The customs of warfare under the law of nations turn out to be extremely permissive. Tracking the prevailing practice of states, the customs permit everything from the slaughter of innocents to the taking of slaves and the looting of civilian property. License to conduct warfare in this way is the special privilege of sovereigns who have ‘solemnized’ their war under the law of nations. Indifferent to the substantive justice of a state’s cause, the law of nations insists instead on certain formalities—a public declaration by the sovereign authority—to give the belligerent its legal status in a solemn war (I.III.iv and III.III). While Grotius defends this status as a way of restoring normal relations between sovereigns at the end of war, he insists that even kings remain accountable to natural justice. The law of nations is derived from human will, and the license it gives in solemn wars cannot contradict the requirements of natural law. The license amounts to an agreement among nations not to punish each other for certain acts (III.IV.ii-iii). So, after many lengthy chapters detailing the range of actions permitted by the law of nations, Grotius takes an abrupt turn, telling the reader that he must now retrace his steps and “deprive those who wage war of nearly all the privileges which I seemed to grant, yet did not grant to them” (III.X.i). Those waging a solemn war may have the privilege of impunity under human law, but a ‘sense of shame’ ought to instill a respect not only for the ‘external’ judgments of the courts but for the ‘internal’ judgments of conscience (III.X and III.XI.i-ii). Those waging an unjust war will be accountable to God, and they have an (unenforceable) obligation to make restitution to those they have wronged. Even those waging war for a just cause should observe the limits of natural justice by sparing the innocent and pursuing only those war aims that are necessary to securing one’s rights. Conducting war merely within the bounds of the law of nations may obtain impunity, but it brings no badge of honor.

What makes kings and peoples worthy of honor is their observance of temperamenta: moderation and restraint in pursuing their just claims. Such restraint comes out of a respect for justice—by restricting the means of war to only what is necessary to achieving the ends—and also out of a sense of humanity. This humane concern for others seeks to limit the impact of war on the innocent and even those fighting on the opposing side (see, for example, III.XI.viii, XII.viii, and XIII.iv). It requires in many cases the remission of punishment, to forgiveness of burdensome war debts, and a preference for restoring local sovereignty rather than imposing imperial rule. At all events, one must uphold good faith in agreements made with the other side in order to build the basis for normal relations after the war (III.XXI-XXV). Humanity holds in view not only the aim of restoring rights but of restoring peace (see III.XXV.ii-iii). Justice might condone war against injuries that threaten the basis for living together in society, but a sense of humanity is fostered by the recognition that we must live together again.

5. Scholarly Interest in Grotius

In the century following his death, Grotius’ works came to be viewed as pivotal in the development of early modern moral and political philosophy. Jean Barbeyrac, in his 1749 essay on the emerging Science of Morality, described Grotius as “breaking the ice” of medieval dogma to make way for a rational approach to ethics. The natural law philosophy of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries—from Pufendorf to Locke, Vattel and Thomasius—took the framework of De Jure Belli ac pacis as a point of departure. This canonical status made Grotius required reading for Enlightenment intellectuals, such that Rousseau would come to describe him in Emile, however critically, as “the master of all the savants” and Adam Smith would credit him in his lectures on jurisprudence as giving the world the most systematic treatment of the subject to date. The 21st century has seen a renewed debate among scholars over the extent of Grotius ‘originality’ in moral thought and in what it consists: the purported secularism of his approach, its rationalism, its refutation of skepticism, its account of obligation, or a variety of other candidates. Beyond these disputes, recent historians of moral and political philosophy have taken special interest in Grotius’ conception of natural rights, his theory of punishment, and his accounts of property and state sovereignty.

Grotius’ legacy, however, is most strongly connected to his contributions to international legal theory and the laws of war. Interest in Grotius saw a revival in the late nineteenth century amid efforts to articulate and institutionalize norms of international law. The peace societies of the time, closely bound up with the international women’s suffrage movement, traced back to the Grotius the evolving conscience of the ‘civilized’ world towards justice and mercy in international conflicts. Andrew Dickson White, the U.S. delegate to the 1899 Hague Peace Conference, regarded Grotius—whom he classed among the world’s Seven Great Statesmen in the Warfare of Humanity with Unreason—as providing the “real foundation of the modern science of international law.” While the claim to being ‘father’ of this law was as disputed as it was common, and despite many critical views of this work—in his 1925 history of political philosophy, Charles Vaughan had called De Jure Belli a “nest of sophistries and contradictions”—Grotius came to have a canonical status in international legal thought. By the end of the Second World War, the legal scholar Hersch Lauterpacht was able to discern a ‘Grotian tradition in international law’ rooted in commitments to the rule of law, to norms beyond positive law, and to the human capacity for moral progress in the law. Grotius continues to be most widely known within the study of just war theory and international law, most notably for the contribution of Mare Liberum to the modern law of the sea.

The preeminence of Grotius in the field of international law exerted its influence as well on the development of international relations theory. Theorists of international relations have commonly viewed Grotius as providing a distinctive conception of international society that provides a middle way between Hobbesian anarchy and Kantian cosmopolitanism. In this schema of ‘realist,’ ‘rationalist,’ and ‘revolutionist’ theories, proposed by Martin Wight and pursued in the work of Hedley Bull and others of the ‘English School’ of international relations theory, the Grotian tradition provides a rationalist account of international society. While rejecting the idea that there are common interests among states sufficient to underpin a supranational authority, the Grotian system identifies a ‘solidarity’ of interests around basic principles of order (such as mutual independence, adherence to promises, the limitation of war) that enables sovereign states to constitute their relations as a (limited) community rather than as a contest governed by the dynamics of power alone.  The association of Grotius with this strain of thought has given his work enduring interest in contemporary international theory.

While reaching the greatest prominence in international thought, the early 21st century scholarship on Grotius has a markedly interdisciplinary character. His works have received considerable attention from political theorists and historians of political thought, as well as by those studying his contributions to moral philosophy, theology and literature. Indeed, the eclecticism of Grotius’ thought pushes beyond modern disciplinary boundaries and springs up continuing dialogues across fields and borders.

6. References and Further Reading

Included in the Primary Sources are selected works of Grotius with a preference for most recently in-print English editions. (Note: references to De Jure Belli in the article provide the book, chapter and section numbers, e.g., II.XXIV.i.). The selected secondary sources include references from the article as well as suggested directions for further reading. The interested scholar will also want to consult the regularly published journal of Grotius studies, Grotiana.

a. Primary Sources

  • Grotius, H. (2006). De Jure Praedae Commentarius / Commentary on the law of prize and booty. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1994). "Commentarius in Theses XI": an Early Treatise on Sovereignty, the Just war, and the Legitimacy of the Dutch Revolt, P. Lang.
  • Grotius, H. (2004). The Free Sea. Indianapolis, IN, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1988). Meletius. Leiden, Netherlands, Brill.
  • Grotius, H. (1990). Defensio Fidei Catholicae de Satisfactione Christi, adversus Faustum Socinum Senensem. Assen/Maastricht, the Netherlands, Van Gorcum.
  • Grotius, H. (2001). De Imperio Summarum Potestatum circa Sacra. Studies in the history of Christian thought, v. 102. H.-J. v. Dam. Leiden, Brill.
  • Grotius, H. (1926). The Jurisprudence of Holland. R. W. Lee. Oxford, Clarendon Press.
  • Grotius, H. (2005). The rights of war and peace. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.
  • Grotius, H. (1962). De Jure Belli ac pacis libri tres / The Law of War and Peace. Indianapolis, Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Grotius, H. (2012). The Truth of the Christian Religion. Indianapolis, Liberty Fund.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Borschberg, P. (1994). “Critical Introduction.” "Commentarius in Theses XI": an Early Treatise on Sovereignty, the Just War, and the Legitimacy of the Dutch Revolt. H. Grotius, P. Lang.
  • Brett, A. (2002). "Natural Right and Civil Community: The Civil Philosophy of Hugo Grotius." The Historical Journal 45(01): 31-51.
  • Bull, H., B. Kingsbury, et al. (1990). Hugo Grotius and International Relations. New York, Clarendon Press.
  • Dumbauld, E. (1969). The Life and Legal Writings of Hugo Grotius. Norman, University of Oklahoma Press.
  • Forde, S. (1998). "Hugo Grotius on Ethics and War." American Political Science Review 92(3): 639-648.
  • Haakonssen, K. (1985). "Hugo Grotius and the History of Political Thought." Political Theory 13(2): 239-265.
  • Heering, J. (2004). “Hugo Grotius' De Veritate Religionis Christianae.” Hugo Grotius as Apologist for the Christian Religion: a Study of his Work De veritate Religionis Christianae, 1640. J. Heering. Leiden, Brill: 41-52.
  • Keene, E. (2002). Beyond the Anarchical Society: Grotius, Colonialism and Order in World Politics, Cambridge University Press.
  • Kinsella, H. M. (2006). "Gendering Grotius: Sex and Sex Difference in the Laws of War." Political Theory 34(2): 161.
  • Meijer, J. (1955). "Hugo Grotius' "Remonstrantie"." Jewish Social Studies 17(2): 91-104.
  • Nellen, H. a. R. E., Ed. (1994). Hugo Grotius Theologian: Essays in Honor of G.H.M. Posthumus Meyjes. New York, Brill.
  • Onuma, Y., Ed. (1993). A Normative Approach to War: Peace, War, and Justice in Hugo Grotius. Oxford, Clarendon Press.
  • Schneewind, J. B. (1998). The Invention of Autonomy: A History of Modern Moral Philosophy. New York, Cambridge University Press, ch. 4.
  • Straumann, B. (2006). "The Right to Punish as a Just Cause of War in Hugo Grotius' Natural Law." Studies in the History of Ethics.
  • Suárez, F. (1944). De Legibus. Selections from Three Works. New York: Clarendon Press.
  • Thomson, E. (2009). "The Dutch Miracle, Modified. Hugo Grotius's Mare Liberum, Commercial Governance and Imperial War in the Early-Seventeenth Century." Grotiana 30(1): 107-130.
  • Tuck, R. (1993). Philosophy and Government, 1572-1651. New York, Cambridge University Press, ch. 5.
  • Tuck, R. (1999). The Rights of War and Peace : Political Thought and the International Order from Grotius to Kant. New York, Oxford University Press, ch. 3.
  • van Gelderen, M. (1993). “Vitoria, Grotius and Human Rights: The Early Experience of Colonialism in Spanish and Dutch Political Thought.” Human Rights and Cultural Diversity. W. Schmale. Goldbach, Germany, Keip Publishing: 215-238.
  • van Gelderen, M. (2006). 'So Meerly Humane': Theories of Resistance in Early-Modern Europe. Rethinking the Foundations of Modern Political Thought. A. S. Brett, J. Tully and H. Hamilton-Bleakley. New York, Cambridge University Press: 149-170.
  • van Ittersum, M. J. (2006). Profit and Principle : Hugo Grotius, Natural Rights Theories and the Rise of Dutch Power in the East Indies, 1595-1615. Leiden, Brill.
  • van Ittersum, M. J. (2010). "The Long Goodbye: Hugo Grotius' Lustification of Dutch Expansion Overseas, 1615-1645." History of European Ideas 36: 386-411.
  • Vitoria, F. d. (1991). On the American Indians. Political writings. A. L. J. Pagden. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Vitoria, F. d. (1991). On the Law of War. Political writings. A. L. J. Pagden. New York, Cambridge University Press.
  • Vreeland, H. (1917). Hugo Grotius, the Father of the Modern Science of International Law. New York, Oxford University Press.
  • Wilson, E. M. (2008). The Savage Republic: De Indis of Hugo Grotius, Republicanism, and Dutch Hegemony within the Early Modern World-System (c. 1600-1619), Martinus Nijhoff Publishers.


Author Information

Andrew Blom
Central Michigan University
U. S. A.

Gottfried Leibniz: Philosophy of Mind

LeibnizGottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716) was a true polymath: he made substantial contributions to a host of different fields such as mathematics, law, physics, theology, and most subfields of philosophy.  Within the philosophy of mind, his chief innovations include his rejection of the Cartesian doctrines that all mental states are conscious and that non-human animals lack souls as well as sensation.  Leibniz’s belief that non-rational animals have souls and feelings prompted him to reflect much more thoroughly than many of his predecessors on the mental capacities that distinguish human beings from lower animals.  Relatedly, the acknowledgment of unconscious mental representations and motivations enabled Leibniz to provide a far more sophisticated account of human psychology.  It also led Leibniz to hold that perception—rather than consciousness, as Cartesians assume—is the distinguishing mark of mentality.

The capacities that make human minds superior to animal souls, according to Leibniz, include not only their capacity for more elevated types of perceptions or mental representations, but also their capacity for more elevated types of appetitions or mental tendencies.  Self-consciousness and abstract thought are examples of perceptions that are exclusive to rational souls, while reasoning and the tendency to do what one judges to be best overall are examples of appetitions of which only rational souls are capable.  The mental capacity for acting freely is another feature that sets human beings apart from animals and it in fact presupposes the capacity for elevated kinds of perceptions as well as appetitions.

Another crucial contribution to the philosophy of mind is Leibniz’s frequently cited mill argument.  This argument is supposed to show, through a thought experiment that involves walking into a mill, that material things such as machines or brains cannot possibly have mental states.  Only immaterial things, that is, soul-like entities, are able to think or perceive.  If this argument succeeds, it shows not only that our minds must be immaterial or that we must have souls, but also that we will never be able to construct a computer that can truly think or perceive.

Finally, Leibniz’s doctrine of pre-established harmony also marks an important innovation in the history of the philosophy of mind.  Like occasionalists, Leibniz denies any genuine interaction between body and soul.  He agrees with them that the fact that my foot moves when I decide to move it, as well as the fact that I feel pain when my body gets injured, cannot be explained by a genuine causal influence of my soul on my body, or of my body on my soul.  Yet, unlike occasionalists, Leibniz also rejects the idea that God continually intervenes in order to produce the correspondence between my soul and my body.  That, Leibniz thinks, would be unworthy of God.  Instead, God has created my soul and my body in such a way that they naturally correspond to each other, without any interaction or divine intervention.  My foot moves when I decide to move it because this motion has been programmed into it from the very beginning.  Likewise, I feel pain when my body is injured because this pain was programmed into my soul.  The harmony or correspondence between mental states and states of the body is therefore pre-established.

Table of Contents

  1. Leibnizian Minds and Mental States
    1. Perceptions
      1. Consciousness, Apperception, and Reflection
      2. Abstract Thought, Concepts, and Universal Truths
    2. Appetitions
  2. Freedom
  3. The Mill Argument
  4. The Relation between Mind and Body
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources in English Translation
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Leibnizian Minds and Mental States

Leibniz is a panpsychist: he believes that everything, including plants and inanimate objects, has a mind or something analogous to a mind.  More specifically, he holds that in all things there are simple, immaterial, mind-like substances that perceive the world around them.  Leibniz calls these mind-like substances ‘monads.’  While all monads have perceptions, however, only some of them are aware of what they perceive, that is, only some of them possess sensation or consciousness.  Even fewer monads are capable of self-consciousness and rational perceptions.  Leibniz typically refers to monads that are capable of sensation or consciousness as ‘souls,’ and to those that are also capable of self-consciousness and rational perceptions as ‘minds.’  The monads in plants, for instance, lack all sensation and consciousness and are hence neither souls nor minds; Leibniz sometimes calls this least perfect type of monad a ‘bare monad’ and compares the mental states of such monads to our states when we are in a stupor or a dreamless sleep.  Animals, on the other hand, can sense and be conscious, and thus possess souls (see Animal Minds).  God and the souls of human beings and angels, finally, are examples of minds because they are self-conscious and rational.  As a result, even though there are mind-like things everywhere for Leibniz, minds in the stricter sense are not ubiquitous.

All monads, even those that lack consciousness altogether, have two basic types of mental states: perceptions, that is, representations of the world around them, and appetitions, or tendencies to transition from one representation to another.  Hence, even though monads are similar to the minds or souls described by Descartes in some ways—after all, they are immaterial substances—consciousness is not an essential property of monads, while it is an essential property of Cartesian souls.  For Leibniz, then, the distinguishing mark of mentality is perception, rather than consciousness (see Simmons 2001).  In fact, even Leibnizian minds in the stricter sense, that is, monads capable of self-consciousness and reasoning, are quite different from the minds in Descartes’s system.  While Cartesian minds are conscious of all their mental states, Leibnizian minds are conscious only of a small portion of their states.  To us it may seem obvious that there is a host of unconscious states in our minds, but in the seventeenth century this was a radical and novel notion.  This profound departure from Cartesian psychology allows Leibniz to paint a much more nuanced picture of the human mind.

One crucial aspect of Leibniz’s panpsychism is that in addition to the rational monad that is the soul of a human being, there are non-rational, bare monads everywhere in the human being’s body.  Leibniz sometimes refers to the soul of a human being or animal as the central or dominant monad of the organism.  The bare monads that are in an animal’s body, accordingly, are subordinate to its dominant monad or soul.  Even plants, for Leibniz, have central or dominant monads, but because they lack sensation, these dominant monads cannot strictly speaking be called souls.  They are merely bare monads, like the monads that are subordinate to them.

The claim that there are mind-like things everywhere in nature—in our bodies, in plants, and even in inanimate objects—strikes many readers of Leibniz as ludicrous.  Yet, Leibniz thinks he has conclusive metaphysical arguments for this claim.  Very roughly, he holds that a complex, divisible thing such as a body can only be real if it is made up of parts that are real.  If the parts in turn have parts, those have to be real as well.  The problem is, Leibniz claims, that matter is infinitely divisible: we can never reach parts that do not themselves have parts.  Even if there were material atoms that we cannot actually divide, they must still be spatially extended, like all matter, and therefore have spatial parts.  If something is spatially extended, after all, we can at least in thought distinguish its left half from its right half, no matter how small it is.  As a result, Leibniz thinks, purely material things are not real.  The reality of complex wholes depends on the reality of their parts, but with purely material things, we never get to parts that are real since we never reach an end in this quest for reality.  Leibniz concludes that there must be something in nature that is not material and not divisible, and from which all things derive their reality.  These immaterial, indivisible things just are monads.  Because of the role they play, Leibniz sometimes describes them as “atoms of substance, that is, real unities absolutely destitute of parts, […] the first absolute principles of the composition of things, and, as it were, the final elements in the analysis of substantial things”  (p. 142.  For a more thorough description of monads, see Leibniz: Metaphysics, as well as the Monadology and the New System of Nature, both included in Ariew and Garber.)

a. Perceptions

As already seen, all monads have perceptions, that is, they represent the world around them.  Yet, not all perceptions—not even all the perceptions of minds—are conscious.  In fact, Leibniz holds that at any given time a mind has infinitely many perceptions, but is conscious only of a very small number of them.  Even souls and bare monads have an infinity of perceptions.  This is because Leibniz believes, for reasons that need not concern us here (but see Leibniz: Metaphysics), that each monad constantly perceives the entire universe.  For instance, even though I am not aware of it at all, my mind is currently representing every single grain of sand on Mars.  Even the monads in my little toe, as well as the monads in the apple I am about to eat, represent those grains of sand.

Leibniz often describes perceptions of things of which the subject is unaware and which are far removed from the subject’s body as ‘confused.’  He is fond of using the sound of the ocean as a metaphor for this kind of confusion: when I go to the beach, I do not hear the sound of each individual wave distinctly; instead, I hear a roaring sound from which I am unable to discern the sounds of the individual waves (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 13, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  None of these individual sounds stands out.  Leibniz claims that confused perceptions in monads are analogous to this confusion of sounds, except of course for the fact that monads do not have to be aware even of the confused whole.  To the extent that a perception does stand out from the rest, however, Leibniz calls it ‘distinct.’  This distinctness comes in degrees, and Leibniz claims that the central monads of organisms always perceive their own bodies more distinctly than they perceive other bodies.

Bare monads are not capable of very distinct perceptions; their perceptual states are always muddled and confused to a high degree.  Animal souls, on the other hand, can have much more distinct perceptions than bare monads.  This is in part because they possess sense organs, such as eyes, which allow them to bundle and condense information about their surroundings (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 4).  The resulting perceptions are so distinct that the animals can remember them later, and Leibniz calls this kind of perception ‘sensation.’  The ability to remember prior perceptions is extremely useful, as a matter of fact, because it enables animals to learn from experience.  For instance, a dog that remembers being beaten with a stick can learn to avoid sticks in the future (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  Sensations are also tied to pleasure and pain: when an animal distinctly perceives some imperfection in its body, such as a bruise, this perception just is a feeling of pain.  Similarly, when an animal perceives some perfection of its body, such as nourishment, this perception is pleasure.  Unlike Descartes, then, Leibniz believed that animals are capable of feeling pleasure and pain.

Consequently, souls differ from bare monads in part through the distinctness of their perceptions: unlike bare monads, souls can have perceptions that are distinct enough to give rise to memory and sensation, and they can feel pleasure and pain.  Rational souls, or minds, share these capacities.  Yet they are additionally capable of perceptions of an even higher level.  Unlike the souls of lower animals, they can reflect on their own mental states, think abstractly, and acquire knowledge of necessary truths.  For instance, they are capable of understanding mathematical concepts and proofs.  Moreover, they can think of themselves as substances and subjects: they have the ability to use and understand the word ‘I’ (see Monadology, section 30).  These kinds of perceptions, for Leibniz, are distinctively rational perceptions, and they are exclusive to minds or rational souls.

It is clear, then, that there are different types of perceptions: some are unconscious, some are conscious, and some constitute reflection or abstract thought.  What exactly distinguishes these types of perceptions, however, is a complicated question that warrants a more detailed investigation.

i. Consciousness, Apperception, and Reflection

Why are some perceptions conscious, while others are not?  In one text, Leibniz explains the difference as follows: “it is good to distinguish between perception, which is the internal state of the monad representing external things, and apperception, which is consciousness, or the reflective knowledge of this internal state, something not given to all souls, nor at all times to a given soul” (Principles of Nature and Grace, section 4).  This passage is interesting for several reasons: Leibniz not only equates consciousness with what he calls ‘apperception,’ and states that only some monads possess it.  He also seems to claim that conscious perceptions differ from other perceptions in virtue of having different types of things as their objects: while unconscious perceptions represent external things, apperception or consciousness has perceptions, that is, internal things, as its object.  Consciousness is therefore closely connected to reflection, as the term ‘reflective knowledge’ also makes clear.

The passage furthermore suggests that Leibniz understands consciousness in terms of higher-order mental states because it says that in order to be conscious of a perception, I must possess “reflective knowledge” of that perception.  One way of interpreting this statement is to understand these higher-order mental states as higher-order perceptions: in order to be conscious of a first-order perception, I must additionally possess a second-order perception of that first-order perception.  For example, in order to be conscious of the glass of water in front of me, I must not only perceive the glass of water, but I must also perceive my perception of the glass of water.  After all, in the passage under discussion, Leibniz defines ‘consciousness’ or ‘apperception’ as the reflective knowledge of a perception.  Such higher-order theories of consciousness are still endorsed by some philosophers of mind today (see Consciousness).  For an alternative interpretation of Leibniz’s theory of consciousness, however, see Jorgensen 2009, 2011a, and 2011b).

There is excellent textual evidence that according to Leibniz, consciousness or apperception is not limited to minds, but is instead shared by animal souls.  One passage in which Leibniz explicitly ascribes apperception to animals is from the New Essays: “beasts have no understanding … although they have the faculty for apperceiving the more conspicuous and outstanding impressions—as when a wild boar apperceives someone who is shouting at it” (p. 173).  Moreover, Leibniz sometimes claims that sensation involves apperception (e.g. New Essays p. 161; p. 188), and since animals are clearly capable of sensation, they must thus possess some form of apperception.  Hence, it seems that Leibniz ascribes apperception to animals, which in turn he elsewhere identifies with consciousness.

Yet, the textual evidence for animal consciousness is unfortunately anything but neat because in the New Essays—that is, in the very same text—Leibniz also suggests that there is an important difference between animals and human beings somewhere in this neighborhood.  In several passages, he says that any creature with consciousness has a moral or personal identity, which in turn is something he grants only to minds.  He states, for instance, that “consciousness or the sense of I proves moral or personal identity” (New Essays, p. 236).  Hence, it seems clear that for Leibniz there is something in the vicinity of consciousness that animals lack and that minds possess, and which is crucial for morality.

A promising solution to this interpretive puzzle is the following: what animals lack is not consciousness generally, but only a particular type of consciousness.  More specifically, while they are capable of consciously perceiving external things, they lack awareness, or at least a particular type of awareness, of the self.  In the Monadology, for instance, Leibniz argues that knowledge of necessary truths distinguishes us from animals and that through this knowledge “we rise to reflexive acts, which enable us to think of that which is called ‘I’ and enable us to consider that this or that is in us” (sections 29-30).  Similarly, he writes in the Principles of Nature and Grace that “minds … are capable of performing reflective acts, and capable of considering what is called ‘I’, substance, soul, mind—in brief, immaterial things and immaterial truths” (section 5).  Self-knowledge, or self-consciousness, then, appears to be exclusive to rational souls.  Leibniz moreover connects this consciousness of the self to personhood and moral responsibility in several texts, such as for instance in the Theodicy: “In saying that the soul of man is immortal one implies the subsistence of what makes the identity of the person, something which retains its moral qualities, conserving the consciousness, or the reflective inward feeling, of what it is: thus it is rendered susceptible to chastisement or reward” (section 89).

Based on these passages, it seems that one crucial cognitive difference between human beings and animals is that even though animals possess the kind of apperception that is involved in sensation and in an acute awareness of external objects, they lack a certain type of apperception or consciousness, namely reflective self-knowledge or self-consciousness.  Especially because of the moral implications of this kind of consciousness that Leibniz posits, this difference is clearly an extremely important one.  According to these texts, then, it is not consciousness or apperception tout court that distinguishes minds from animal souls, but rather a particular kind of apperception.  What animals are incapable of, according to Leibniz, is self-knowledge or self-awareness, that is, an awareness not only of their perceptions, but also of the self that is having those perceptions.

Because Leibniz associates consciousness so closely with reflection, one might wonder whether the fact that animals are capable of conscious perceptions implies that they are also capable of reflection.  This is another difficult interpretive question because there appears to be evidence both for a positive and for a negative answer.  Reflection, according to Leibniz, is “nothing but attention to what is within us” (New Essays, p. 51).  Moreover, as already seen, he argues that reflective acts enable us “to think of that which is called ‘I’ and … to consider that this or that is in us” (Monadology, section 30).  Leibniz does not appear to ascribe reflection to animals explicitly, and in fact, there are several texts in which he says in no uncertain terms that they lack reflection altogether.  He states for instance that “the soul of a beast has no more reflection than an atom” (Loemker, p. 588).  Likewise, he defines ‘intellection’ as “a distinct perception combined with a faculty of reflection, which the beasts do not have” (New Essays, p. 173) and explains that “just as there are two sorts of perception, one simple, the other accompanied by reflections that give rise to knowledge and reasoning, so there are two kinds of souls, namely ordinary souls, whose perception is without reflection, and rational souls, which think about what they do” (Strickland, p. 84).

On the other hand, as seen, Leibniz does ascribe apperception or consciousness to animals, and consciousness in turn appears to involve higher-order mental states.  This suggests that Leibnizian animals must perceive or know their own perceptions when they are conscious of something, and that in turn seems to imply that they can reflect after all.  A closely related reason for ascribing reflection to animals is that Leibniz sometimes explicitly associates reflection with apperception or consciousness.  In a passage already quoted above, for instance, Leibniz defines ‘consciousness’ as the reflective knowledge of a first-order perception.  Hence, if animals possess consciousness it seems that they must also have some type of reflection.

We are consequently faced with an interpretive puzzle: even though there is strong indirect evidence that Leibniz attributes reflection to animals, there is also direct evidence against it.  There are at least two ways of solving this puzzle.  In order to make sense of passages in which Leibniz restricts reflection to rational souls, one can either deny that perceiving one’s internal states is sufficient for reflection, or one can distinguish between different types of reflection, in such a way that the most demanding type of reflection is limited to minds.  One good way to deny that perception of one’s internal states is sufficient for reflection is to point out that Leibniz defines reflection as “attention to what is within us” (New Essays, p. 51), rather than as ‘perception of what is within us.’  Attention to internal states, arguably, is more demanding than mere perception of these states, and animals may well be incapable of the former.  Attention might be a particularly distinct perception, for instance.  Alternatively, one can argue that reflection requires a self-concept, or self-knowledge, which also goes beyond the mere perception of internal states and may be inaccessible to animals.  Perceiving my internal states, on that interpretation, amounts to reflection only if I also possess knowledge of the self that is having those states.  Instead of denying that perceiving one’s own states is sufficient for reflection, one can also distinguish different types of reflection and claim that while the mere perception of one’s internal states is a type of reflection, there is a more demanding type of reflection that requires attention, a self-concept, or something similar.  Yet, the difference between those two responses appears to be merely terminological.  Based on the textual evidence discussed above, it is clear that either reflection generally, or at least a particular type of reflection, must be exclusive to minds.

ii. Abstract Thought, Concepts, and Universal Truths

So far, we have seen that one cognitive capacity that elevates minds above animal souls is self-consciousness, which is a particular type of reflection.  Before turning to appetitions, we should briefly investigate three additional, mutually related, cognitive abilities that only minds possess, namely the abilities to abstract, to form or possess concepts, and to know general truths.  In what may well be Leibniz’s most intriguing discussion of abstraction, he says that some non-human animals “apparently recognize whiteness, and observe it in chalk as in snow; but it does not amount to abstraction, which requires attention to the general apart from the particular, and consequently involves knowledge of universal truths which beasts do not possess” (New Essays, p. 142).  In this passage, we learn not only that beasts are incapable of abstraction, but also that abstraction involves “attention to the general apart from the particular” as well as “knowledge of universal truths.”  Hence, abstraction for Leibniz seems to consist in separating out one part of a complex idea and focusing on it exclusively.  Instead of thinking of different white things, one must think of whiteness in general, abstracting away from the particular instances of whiteness.  In order to think about whiteness in the abstract, then, it is not enough to perceive different white things as similar to one another.

Yet, it might still seem mysterious how precisely animals should be able to observe whiteness in different objects if they are unable to abstract.  One fact that makes this less mysterious, however, is that, on Leibniz’s view, while animals are unable to pay attention to whiteness in general, the idea of whiteness may nevertheless play a role in their recognition of whiteness.  As Leibniz explains in the New Essays, even though human minds are aware of complex ideas and particular truths first as well as rather easily, and have to expend a lot of effort to subsequently achieve awareness of simple ideas and general principles, the order of nature is the other way around:

The truths that we start by being aware of are indeed particular ones, just as we start with the coarsest and most composite ideas.  But that doesn’t alter the fact that in the order of nature the simplest comes first, and that the reasons for particular truths rest wholly on the more general ones of which they are mere instances. … The mind relies on these principles constantly; but it does not find it so easy to sort them out and to command a distinct view of each of them separately, for that requires great attention to what it is doing. (p. 83f.)

Here, Leibniz says that minds can rely on general principles, or abstract ideas, without being aware of them, and without having distinct perceptions of them separately.  This might help us to explain how animals can observe whiteness in different white objects without being able to abstract: the simple idea of whiteness might play a role in their cognition, even though they are not aware of it, and are unable to pay attention to this idea.

The passage just quoted is interesting for another reason: It shows that abstracting and achieving knowledge of general truths have a lot in common and presuppose the capacity to reflect.  It takes a special effort of mind to become aware of abstract ideas and general truths, that is, to separate these out from complex ideas and particular truths.  It is this special effort, it seems, of which animals are incapable; while they can at times achieve relatively distinct perceptions of complex or particular things, they lack the ability to pay attention, or at least sufficient attention, to their internal states.  At least part of the reason for their inability to abstract and to know general truths, then, appears to be their inability, or at least very limited ability, to reflect.

Abstraction also seems closely related to the possession or formation of concepts: arguably, what a mind gains when abstracting the idea of whiteness from the complex ideas of particular white things is what we would call a concept of whiteness.  Hence, since animals cannot abstract, they do not possess such concepts.  They may nevertheless, as suggested above, have confused ideas such as a confused idea of whiteness that allows them to recognize whiteness in different white things, without enabling them to pay attention to whiteness in the abstract.

An interesting question that arises in this context is the question whether having an idea of the future or thinking about a future state requires abstraction.  One reason to think so is that, plausibly, in order to think about the future, for instance about future pleasures or pains, one needs to abstract from the present pleasures or pains that one can directly experience, or from past pleasures and pains that one remembers.  After all, just as one can only attain the concept of whiteness by abstracting from other properties of the particular white things one has experienced, so, arguably, one can only acquire the idea of future pleasures through abstraction from particular present pleasures.  It may be for this reason that Leibniz sometimes notes that animals have “neither foresight nor anxiety for the future” (Huggard, p. 414).  Apparently, he does not consider animals capable of having an idea of the future or of future states.

Leibniz thinks that in addition to sensible concepts such as whiteness, we also have concepts that are not derived from the senses, that is, we possess intellectual concepts.  The latter, it seems, set us apart even farther from animals because we attain them through reflective self-awareness, of which animals, as seen above, are not capable.  Leibniz says, for instance, that “being is innate in us—the knowledge of being is comprised in the knowledge that we have of ourselves.  Something like this holds of other general notions” (New Essays, p. 102).  Similarly, he states a few pages later that “reflection enables us to find the idea of substance within ourselves, who are substances” (New Essays, p. 105).  Many similar statements can be found elsewhere.  The intellectual concepts that we can discover in our souls, according to Leibniz, include not only being and substance, but also unity, similarity, sameness, pleasure, cause, perception, action, duration, doubting, willing, and reasoning, to name only a few.  In order to derive these concepts from our reflective self-awareness, we must apparently engage in abstraction: I am distinctly aware of myself as an agent, a substance, and a perceiver, for instance, and from this awareness I can abstract the ideas of action, substance, and perception in general.  This means that animals are inferior to us among other things in the following two ways: they cannot have distinct self-awareness, and they cannot abstract.  They would need both of these capacities in order to form intellectual concepts, and they would need the latter—that is, abstraction—in order to form sensible concepts.

Intellectual concepts are not the only things that minds can find in themselves: in addition, they are also able to discover eternal or general truths there, such as the axioms or principles of logic, metaphysics, ethics, and natural theology.  Like the intellectual concepts just mentioned, these general truths or principles cannot be derived from the senses and can thus be classified as innate ideas.  Leibniz says, for instance,

Above all, we find [in this I and in the understanding] the force of the conclusions of reasoning, which are part of what is called the natural light. … It is also by this natural light that the axioms of mathematics are recognized. … [I]t is generally true that we know [necessary truths] only by this natural light, and not at all by the experiences of the senses. (Ariew and Garber, p. 189)

Axioms and general principles, according to this passage, must come from the mind itself and cannot be acquired through sense experience.  Yet, also as in the case of intellectual concepts, it is not easy for us to discover such general truths or principles in ourselves; instead, it takes effort or special attention.  It again appears to require the kind of attention to what is within us of which animals are not capable.  Because they lack this type of reflection, animals are “governed purely by examples from the senses” and “consequently can never arrive at necessary and general truths” (Strickland p. 84).

b. Appetitions

Monads possess not only perceptions, or representations of the world they inhabit, but also appetitions.  These appetitions are the tendencies or inclinations of these monads to act, that is, to transition from one mental state to another.  The most familiar examples of appetitions are conscious desires, such as my desire to have a drink of water.  Having this desire means that I have some tendency to drink from the glass of water in front of me.  If the desire is strong enough, and if there are no contrary tendencies or desires in my mind that are stronger—for instance, the desire to win the bet that I can refrain from drinking water for one hour—I will attempt to drink the water.  This desire for water is one example of a Leibnizian appetition.  Yet, just as in the case of perceptions, only a very small portion of appetitions is conscious.  We are unaware of most of the tendencies that lead to changes in our perceptions.  For instance, I am aware neither of perceiving my hair growing, nor of my tendencies to have those perceptions.  Moreover, as in the case of perceptions, there are an infinite number of appetitions in any monad at any given time.  This is because, as seen, each monad represents the entire universe.  As a result, each monad constantly transitions from one infinitely complex perceptual state to another, reflecting all changes that take place in the universe.  The tendency that leads to a monad’s transition from one of these infinitely complex perceptual states to another is therefore also infinitely complex, or composed of infinitely many smaller appetitions.

The three types of monads—bare monads, souls, and minds—differ not only with respect to their perceptual or cognitive capacities, but also with respect to their appetitive capacities.  In fact, there are good reasons to think that three different types of appetitions correspond to the three types of perceptions mentioned above, that is, to perception, sensation, and rational perception.  After all, Leibniz distinguishes between appetitions of which we can be aware and those of which we cannot be aware, which he sometimes also calls ‘insensible appetitions’ or ‘insensible inclinations.’  He appears to further divide the type of which we can be aware into rational and non-rational appetitions.  This threefold division is made explicit in a passage from the New Essays:

There are insensible inclinations of which we are not aware.  There are sensible ones: we are acquainted with their existence and their objects, but have no sense of how they are constituted. … Finally there are distinct inclinations which reason gives us: we have a sense both of their strength and of their constitution. (p. 194)

According to this passage, then, Leibniz acknowledges the following three types of appetitions: (a) insensible or unconscious appetitions, (b) sensible or conscious appetitions, and (c) distinct or rational appetitions.

Even though Leibniz does not say so explicitly, he furthermore believes that bare monads have only unconscious appetitions, that animal souls additionally have conscious appetitions, and that only minds have distinct or rational appetitions.  Unconscious appetitions are tendencies such as the one that leads to my perception of my hair growing, or the one that prompts me unexpectedly to perceive the sound of my alarm in the morning.  All appetitions in bare monads are of this type; they are not aware of any of their tendencies.  An example of a sensible appetition, on the other hand, is an appetition for pleasure.  My desire for a piece of chocolate, for instance, is such an appetition: I am aware that I have this desire and I know what the object of the desire is, but I do not fully understand why I have it.  Animals are capable of this kind of appetition; in fact, many of their actions are motivated by their appetitions for pleasure.  Finally, an example of a rational appetition is the appetition for something that my intellect has judged to be the best course of action.  Leibniz appears to identify the capacity for this kind of appetition with the will, which, as we will see below, plays a crucial role in Leibniz’s theory of freedom.  What is distinctive of this kind of appetition is that whenever we possess it, we are not only aware of it and of its object, but also understand why we have it.  For instance, if I judge that I ought to call my mother and consequently desire to call her, Leibniz thinks, I am aware of the thought process that led me to make this judgment, and hence of the origins of my desire.

Another type of rational appetition is the type of appetition involved in reasoning.  As seen, Leibniz thinks that animals, because they can remember prior perceptions, are able to learn from experience, like the dog that learns to run away from sticks.  This sort of behavior, which involves a kind of inductive inference (see Deductive and Inductive Arguments), can be called a “shadow of reasoning,” Leibniz tells us (New Essays, p. 50).  Yet, animals are incapable of true—that is, presumably, deductive—reasoning, which, Leibniz tells us, “depends on necessary or eternal truths, such as those of logic, numbers, and geometry, which bring about an indubitable connection of ideas and infallible consequences” (Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).  Only minds can reason in this stricter sense.

Some interpreters think that reasoning consists simply in very distinct perception.  Yet that cannot be the whole story.  First of all, reasoning must involve a special type of perception that differs from the perceptions of lower animals in kind, rather than merely in degree, namely abstract thought and the perception of eternal truths.  This kind of perception is not just more distinct; it has entirely different objects than the perceptions of non-rational souls, as we saw above.  Moreover, it seems more accurate to describe reasoning as a special kind of appetition or tendency than as a special kind of perception.  This is because reasoning is not just one perception, but rather a series of perceptions.  Leibniz for instance calls it “a chain of truths” (New Essays, p. 199) and defines it as “the linking together of truths” (Huggard, p. 73).  Thus, reasoning is not the same as perceiving a certain type of object, nor as perceiving an object in a particular fashion.  Rather, it consists mainly in special types of transitions between perceptions and therefore, according to Leibniz’s account of how monads transition from perception to perception, in appetitions for these transitions.  What a mind needs in order to be rational, therefore, are appetitions that one could call the principles of reasoning.  These appetitions or principles allow minds to transition, for instance, from the premises of an argument to its conclusion.  In order to conclude ‘Socrates is mortal’ from ‘All men are mortal’ and ‘Socrates is a man,’ for example, I not only need to perceive the premises distinctly, but I also need an appetition for transitioning from premises of a particular form to conclusions of a particular form.

Leibniz states in several texts that our reasonings are based on two fundamental principles: the Principle of Contradiction and the Principle of Sufficient Reason.  Human beings also have access to several additional innate truths and principles, for instance those of logic, mathematics, ethics, and theology.  In virtue of these principles we have a priori knowledge of necessary connections between things, while animals can only have empirical knowledge of contingent, or merely apparent, connections.  The perceptions of animals, then, are not governed by the principles on which our reasonings are based; the closest an animal can come to reasoning is, as mentioned, engaging in empirical inference or induction, which is based not on principles of reasoning, but merely on the recognition and memory of regularities in previous experience.  This confirms that reasoning is a type of appetition: using, or being able to use, principles of reasoning cannot just be a matter of perceiving the world more distinctly.  In fact, these principles are not something that we acquire or derive from perceptions.  Instead, at least the most basic ones are innate dispositions for making certain kinds of transitions.

In connection with reasoning, it is important to note that even though Leibniz sometimes uses the term ‘thought’ for perceptions generally, he makes it clear in some texts that it strictly speaking belongs exclusively to minds because it is “perception joined with reason” (Strickland p. 66; see also New Essays, p. 210).  This means that the ability to think in this sense, just like reasoning, is also something that is exclusive to minds, that is, something that distinguishes minds from animal souls.  Non-rational souls neither reason nor think, strictly speaking; they do however have perceptions.

The distinctive cognitive and appetitive capacities of the three types of monads are summarized in the following table:

Leibniz-Mind table

2. Freedom

One final capacity that sets human beings apart from non-rational animals is the capacity for acting freely.  This is mainly because Leibniz closely connects free agency with rationality: acting freely requires acting in accordance with one’s rational assessment of which course of action is best.  Hence, acting freely involves rational perceptions as well as rational appetitions.  It requires both knowledge of, or rational judgments about, the good, as well as the tendency to act in accordance with these judgments.  For Leibniz, the capacity for rational judgments is called ‘intellect,’ and the tendency to pursue what the intellect judges to be best is called ‘will.’  Non-human animals, because they do not possess intellects and wills, or the requisite type of perceptions and appetitions, lack freedom.  This also means, however, that most human actions are not free, because we only sometimes reason about the best course of action and act voluntarily, on the basis of our rational judgments.  Leibniz in fact stresses that in three quarters of their actions, human beings act just like animals, that is, without making use of their rationality (see Principles of Nature and Grace, section 5, in Ariew and Garber, 1989).

In addition to rationality, Leibniz claims, free actions must be self-determined and contingent (see e.g. Theodicy, section 288).  An action is self-determined—or spontaneous, as Leibniz often calls it—when its source is in the agent, rather than in another agent or some other external entity.  While all actions of monads are spontaneous in a general sense since, as we will see in section four, Leibniz denies all interaction among created substances, he may have a more demanding notion of spontaneity in mind when he calls it a requirement for freedom.  After all, when an agent acts on the basis of her rational judgment, she is not even subject to the kind of apparent influence of her body or of other creatures that is present, for instance, when someone pinches her and she feels pain.

In order to be contingent, on the other hand, the action cannot be the result of compulsion or necessitation.  This, again, is generally true for all actions of monads because Leibniz holds that all changes in the states of a creature are contingent.  Yet, there may again be an especially demanding sense in which free actions are contingent for Leibniz.  He often says that when a rational agent does something because she believes it to be best, the goodness she perceives, or her motives for acting, merely incline her towards action without necessitating action (see e.g. Huggard, p. 419; Fifth Letter to Clarke, sections 8-9; Ariew and Garber, p. 195; New Essays, p. 175).  Hence, Leibniz may be attributing a particular kind of contingency to free actions.

Even though Leibniz holds that free actions must be contingent, that is, that they cannot be necessary, he grants that they can be determined.  In fact, Leibniz vehemently rejects the notion that a world with free agents must contain genuine indeterminacy.  Hence, Leibniz is what we today call a compatibilist about freedom and determinism (see Free Will).  He believes that all actions, whether they are free or not, are determined by the nature and the prior states of the agent.  What is special about free actions, then, is not that they are undetermined, but rather that they are determined, among other things, by rational perceptions of the good.  We always do what we are most strongly inclined to do, for Leibniz, and if we are most strongly inclined by our judgment about the best course of action, we pursue that course of action freely.  The ability to act contrary even to one’s best reasons or motives, Leibniz contends, is not required for freedom, nor would it be worth having.   As Leibniz puts it in the New Essays, “the freedom to will contrary to all the impressions which may come from the understanding … would destroy true liberty, and reason with it, and would bring us down below the beasts” (p. 180).  In fact, being determined by our rational understanding of the good, as we are in our free actions, makes us godlike, because according to Leibniz, God is similarly determined by what he judges to be best.  Nothing could be more perfect and more desirable than acting in this way.

3. The Mill Argument

In several of his writings, Leibniz argues that purely material things such as brains or machines cannot possibly think or perceive.  Hence, Leibniz contends that materialists like Thomas Hobbes are wrong to think that they can explain mentality in terms of the brain.  This argument is without question among Leibniz’s most influential contributions to the philosophy of mind.  It is relevant not only to the question whether human minds might be purely material, but also to the question whether artificial intelligence is possible.  Because Leibniz’s argument against perception in material objects often employs a thought experiment involving a mill, interpreters refer to it as ‘the mill argument.’  There is considerable disagreement among recent scholars about the correct interpretation of this argument (see References and Further Reading).  The present section sketches one plausible way of interpreting Leibniz’s mill argument.

The most famous version of Leibniz’s mill argument occurs in section 17 of the Monadology:

Moreover, we must confess that perception, and what depends on it, is inexplicable in terms of mechanical reasons, that is, through shapes and motions.  If we imagine that there is a machine whose structure makes it think, sense, and have perceptions, we could conceive it enlarged, keeping the same proportions, so that we could enter into it, as one enters into a mill.  Assuming that, when inspecting its interior, we will only find parts that push one another, and we will never find anything to explain a perception.  And so, we should seek perception in the simple substance and not in the composite or in the machine.

To understand this argument, it is important to recall that Leibniz, like many of his contemporaries, views all material things as infinitely divisible.  As already seen, he holds that there are no smallest or most fundamental material elements, and every material thing, no matter how small, has parts and is hence complex.  Even if there were physical atoms—against which Leibniz thinks he has conclusive metaphysical arguments—they would still have to be extended, like all matter, and we would hence be able to distinguish between an atom’s left half and its right half.  The only truly simple things that exist are monads, that is, unextended, immaterial, mind-like things.  Based on this understanding of material objects, Leibniz argues in the mill passage that only immaterial entities are capable of perception because it is impossible to explain perception mechanically, or in terms of material parts pushing one another.

Unfortunately Leibniz does not say explicitly why exactly he thinks there cannot be a mechanical explanation of perception.  Yet it becomes clear in other passages that for Leibniz perceiving has to take place in a simple thing.  This assumption, in turn, straightforwardly implies that matter—which as seen is complex—is incapable of perception.  This, most likely, is behind Leibniz’s mill argument.  Why does Leibniz claim that perception can only take place in simple things?  If he did not have good reasons for this claim, after all, it would not constitute a convincing starting point for his mill argument.

Leibniz’s reasoning appears to be the following.  Material things, such as mirrors or paintings, can represent complexity.  When I stand in front of a mirror, for instance, the mirror represents my body.  This is an example of the representation of one complex material thing in another complex material thing.  Yet, Leibniz argues, we do not call such a representation ‘perception’: the mirror does not “perceive” my body.  The reason this representation falls short of perception, Leibniz contends, is that it lacks the unity that is characteristic of perceptions: the top part of the mirror represents the top part of my body, and so on.  The representation of my body in the mirror is merely a collection of smaller representations, without any genuine unity.  When another person perceives my body, on the other hand, her representation of my body is a unified whole.  No physical thing can do better than the mirror in this respect: the only way material things can represent anything is through the arrangement or properties of their parts.  As a result, any such representation will be spread out over multiple parts of the representing material object and hence lack genuine unity.  It is arguably for this reason that Leibniz defines ‘perception’ as “the passing state which involves and represents a multitude in the unity or in the simple substance” (Monadology, section 14).

Leibniz’s mill argument, then, relies on a particular understanding of perception and of material objects.  Because all material objects are complex and because perceptions require unity, material objects cannot possibly perceive.  Any representation a machine, or a material object, could produce would lack the unity required for perception.  The mill example is supposed to illustrate this: even an extremely small machine, if it is purely material, works only in virtue of the arrangement of its parts.  Hence, it is always possible, at least in principle, to enlarge the machine.  When we imagine the machine thus enlarged, that is, when we imagine being able to distinguish the machine’s parts as we can distinguish the parts of a mill, we will realize that the machine cannot possibly have genuine perceptions.

Yet the basic idea behind Leibniz’s mill argument can be appealing even to those of us who do not share Leibniz’s assumptions about perception and material objects.  In fact, it appears to be a more general version of what is today called “the hard problem of consciousness," that is, the problem of explaining how something physical could explain, or give rise to, consciousness.  While Leibniz’s mill argument is about perception generally, rather than conscious perception in particular, the underlying structure of the argument appears to be similar: mental states have characteristics—such as their unity or their phenomenal properties—that, it seems, cannot even in principle be explained physically.  There is an explanatory gap between the physical and the mental.

4. The Relation between Mind and Body

The mind-body problem is a central issue in the philosophy of mind.  It is, roughly, the problem of explaining how mind and body can causally interact.  That they interact seems exceedingly obvious: my mental states, such as for instance my desire for a cold drink, do seem capable of producing changes in my body, such as the bodily motions required for walking to the fridge and retrieving a bottle of water.  Likewise, certain physical states seem capable of producing changes in my mind: when I stub my toe on my way to the fridge, for instance, this event in my body appears to cause me pain, which is a mental state.  For Descartes and his followers, it is notoriously difficult to explain how mind and body causally interact.  After all, Cartesians are substance dualists: they believe that mind and body are substances of a radically different type (see Descartes: Mind-Body Distinction).  How could a mental state such as a desire cause a physical state such as a bodily motion, or vice versa, if mind and body have absolutely nothing in common?  This is the version of the mind-body problem that Cartesians face.

For Leibniz, the mind-body problem does not arise in exactly the way it arises for Descartes and his followers, because Leibniz is not a substance dualist.  We have already seen that, according to Leibniz, an animal or human being has a central monad, which constitutes its soul, as well as subordinate monads that are everywhere in its body.  In fact, Leibniz appears to hold that the body just is the collection of these subordinate monads and their perceptions (see e.g. Principles of Nature and Grace section 3), or that bodies result from monads (Ariew and Garber, p. 179).  After all, as already seen, he holds that purely material, extended things would not only be incapable of perception, but would also not be real because of their infinite divisibility.  The only truly real things, for Leibniz, are monads, that is, immaterial and indivisible substances.  This means that Leibniz, unlike Descartes, does not believe that there are two fundamentally different kinds of substances, namely physical and mental substances.  Instead, for Leibniz, all substances are of the same general type.  As a result, the mind-body problem may seem more tractable for Leibniz: if bodies have a semi-mental nature, there are fewer obvious obstacles to claiming that bodies and minds can interact with one another.

Yet, for complicated reasons that are beyond the scope of this article (but see Leibniz: Causation), Leibniz held that human minds and their bodies—as well as any created substances, in fact—cannot causally interact.  In this, he agrees with occasionalists such as Nicolas Malebranche.  Leibniz departs from occasionalists, however, in his positive account of the relation between mental and corresponding bodily events.  Occasionalists hold that God needs to intervene in nature constantly to establish this correspondence.  When I decide to move my foot, for instance, God intervenes and moves my foot accordingly, occasioned by my decision.  Leibniz, however, thinks that such interventions would constitute perpetual miracles and be unworthy of a God who always acts in the most perfect manner.  God arranged things so perfectly, Leibniz contends, that there is no need for these divine interventions.  Even though he endorses the traditional theological doctrine that God continually conserves all creatures in existence and concurs with their actions (see Leibniz: Causation), Leibniz stresses that all natural events in the created world are caused and made intelligible by the natures of created things.  In other words, Leibniz rejects the occasionalist doctrine that God is the only active, efficient cause, and that the laws of nature that govern natural events are merely God’s intentions to move his creatures around in a particular way.  Instead for Leibniz these laws, or God’s decrees about the ways in which created things should behave, are written into the natures of these creatures.  God not only decided how creatures should act, but also gave them natures and natural powers from which these actions follow.  To understand the regularities and events in nature, we do not need to look beyond the natures of creatures.  This, Leibniz claims, is much more worthy of a perfect God than the occasionalist world, in which natural events are not internally intelligible.

How, then, does Leibniz explain the correspondence between mental and bodily states if he denies that there is genuine causal interaction among finite things and also denies that God brings about the correspondence by constantly intervening?  Consider again the example in which I decide to get a drink from the fridge and my body executes that decision.  It may seem that unless there is a fairly direct link between my decision and the action—either a link supplied by God’s intervention, or by the power of my mind to cause bodily motion—it would be an enormous coincidence that my body carries out my decision.  Yet, Leibniz thinks there is a third option, which he calls ‘pre-established harmony.’  On this view, God created my body and my mind in such a way that they naturally, but without any direct causal links, correspond to one another.  God knew, before he created my body, that I would decide to get a cold drink, and hence made my body in such a way that it will, in virtue of its own nature, walk to the fridge and get a bottle of water right after my mind makes that decision.

In one text, Leibniz provides a helpful analogy for his doctrine of pre-established harmony.  Imagine two pendulum clocks that are in perfect agreement for a long period of time.  There are three ways to ensure this kind of correspondence between them: (a) establishing a causal link, such as a connection between the pendulums of these clocks, (b) asking a person constantly to synchronize the two clocks, and (c) designing and constructing these clocks so perfectly that they will remain perfectly synchronized without any causal links or adjustments (see Ariew and Garber, pp. 147-148).  Option (c), Leibniz contends, is superior to the other two options, and it is in this way that God ensures that the states of my mind correspond to the states of my body, or in fact, that the perceptions of any created substance harmonize with the perceptions of any other.  The world is arranged and designed so perfectly that events in one substance correspond to events in another substance even though they do not causally interact, and even though God does not intervene to adjust one to the other.  Because of his infinite wisdom and foreknowledge, God was able to pre-establish this mutual correspondence or harmony when he created the world, analogously to the way a skilled clockmaker can construct two clocks that perfectly correspond to one another for a period of time.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources in English Translation

  • Ariew, Roger and Daniel Garber, eds. Philosophical Essays. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
    • Contains translations of many of Leibniz’s most important shorter writings such as the Monadology, the Principles of Nature and Grace, the Discourse on Metaphysics, and excerpts from Leibniz’s correspondence, to name just a few.
  • Ariew, Roger, ed.  Correspondence [between Leibniz and Clarke]. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2000.
    • A translation of Leibniz’s correspondence with Samuel Clarke, which touches on many important topics in metaphysics and philosophy of mind.
  • Francks, Richard and Roger S. Woolhouse, eds. Leibniz's 'New System' and Associated Contemporary Texts. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Francks, Richard and Roger S. Woolhouse, eds. Philosophical Texts. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Huggard, E. M., ed. Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man and the Origin of Evil. La Salle: Open Court, 1985.
    • Translation of the only philosophical monograph Leibniz published in his lifetime, which contains many important discussions of free will.
  • Lodge, Paul, ed. The Leibniz–De Volder Correspondence: With Selections from the Correspondence between Leibniz and Johann Bernoulli. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2013.
    • An edition, with English translations, of Leibniz’s correspondence with De Volder, which is a very important source of information about Leibniz’s mature metaphysics.
  • Loemker, Leroy E., ed. Philosophical Papers and Letters. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1970.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Look, Brandon and Donald Rutherford, eds. The Leibniz–Des Bosses Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2007.
    • An edition, with English translations, of Leibniz’s correspondence with Des Bosses, which is another important source of information about Leibniz’s mature metaphysics.
  • Parkinson, George Henry Radcliffe and Mary Morris, eds. Philosophical Writings. London: Everyman, 1973.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.
  • Remnant, Peter and Jonathan Francis Bennett, eds. New Essays on Human Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • Translation of Leibniz’s section-by-section response to Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding, written in the form of a dialogue between the two fictional characters Philalethes and Theophilus, who represent Locke’s and Leibniz’s views, respectively.
  • Rescher, Nicholas, ed. G.W. Leibniz's Monadology: An Edition for Students. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1991.
    • An edition, with English translation, of the Monadology, with commentary and a useful collection of parallel passages from other Leibniz texts.
  • Strickland, Lloyd H., ed. The Shorter Leibniz Texts: A Collection of New Translations. London: Continuum, 2006.
    • Contains English translations of additional short texts.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
    • One of the most influential and rigorous works on Leibniz’s metaphysics.
  • Borst, Clive. "Leibniz and the Compatibilist Account of Free Will." Studia Leibnitiana 24.1 (1992): 49-58.
    • About Leibniz’s views on free will.
  • Brandom, Robert. "Leibniz and Degrees of Perception." Journal of the History of Philosophy 19 (1981): 447-79.
    • About Leibniz’s views on perception and perceptual distinctness.
  • Davidson, Jack. "Imitators of God: Leibniz on Human Freedom." Journal of the History of Philosophy 36.3 (1998): 387-412.
    • Another helpful article about Leibniz’s views on free will and on the ways in which human freedom resembles divine freedom.
  • Davidson, Jack. "Leibniz on Free Will." The Continuum Companion to Leibniz. Ed. Brandon Look. London: Continuum, 2011. 208-222.
    • Accessible general introduction to Leibniz’s views on freedom of the will.
  • Duncan, Stewart. "Leibniz's Mill Argument Against Materialism." Philosophical Quarterly 62.247 (2011): 250-72.
    • Helpful discussion of Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • Garber, Daniel. Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • A thorough study of the development of Leibniz’s metaphysical views.
  • Gennaro, Rocco J. "Leibniz on Consciousness and Self-Consciousness." New Essays on the Rationalists. Eds. Rocco J. Gennaro and C. Huenemann. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. 353-371.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s views on consciousness and highlights the advantages of reading Leibniz as endorsing a higher-order thought theory of consciousness.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. Leibniz. London; New York: Routledge, 2005.
    • Good general introduction to Leibniz’s philosophy; includes chapters on the mind and freedom.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "Leibniz on Memory and Consciousness." British Journal for the History of Philosophy 19.5 (2011a): 887-916.
    • Elaborates on Jorgensen (2009) and discusses the role of memory in Leibniz’s theory of consciousness.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "Mind the Gap: Reflection and Consciousness in Leibniz." Studia Leibnitiana 43.2 (2011b): 179-95.
    • About Leibniz’s account of reflection and reasoning.
  • Jorgensen, Larry M. "The Principle of Continuity and Leibniz's Theory of Consciousness." Journal of the History of Philosophy 47.2 (2009): 223-48.
    • Argues against ascribing a higher-order theory of consciousness to Leibniz.
  • Kulstad, Mark. Leibniz on Apperception, Consciousness, and Reflection. Munich: Philosophia, 1991.
    • Influential, meticulous study of Leibniz’s views on consciousness.
  • Kulstad, Mark. "Leibniz, Animals, and Apperception." Studia Leibnitiana 13 (1981): 25-60.
    • A shorter discussion of some of the issues in Kulstad (1991).
  • Lodge, Paul, and Marc E. Bobro. "Stepping Back Inside Leibniz's Mill." The Monist 81.4 (1998): 553-72.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • Lodge, Paul. "Leibniz's Mill Argument Against Mechanical Materialism Revisited." Ergo (2014).
    • Further discussion of Leibniz’s mill argument.
  • McRae, Robert. Leibniz: Perception, Apperception, and Thought. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1976.
    • An important and still helpful, even if somewhat dated, study of Leibniz’s philosophy of mind.
  • Murray, Michael J. "Spontaneity and Freedom in Leibniz." Leibniz: Nature and Freedom. Eds. Donald Rutherford and Jan A. Cover. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005. 194-216.
    • Discusses Leibniz’s views on free will and self-determination, or spontaneity.
  • Phemister, Pauline. "Leibniz, Freedom of Will and Rationality." Studia Leibnitiana 26.1 (1991): 25-39.
    • Explores the connections between rationality and freedom in Leibniz.
  • Rozemond, Marleen. "Leibniz on the Union of Body and Soul." Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 79.2 (1997): 150-78.
    • About the mind-body problem and pre-established harmony in Leibniz.
  • Rozemond, Marleen. "Mills Can't Think: Leibniz's Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Res Philosophica 91.1 (2014): 1-28.
    • Another helpful discussion of the mill argument.
  • Savile, Anthony. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Leibniz and the Monadology. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Very accessible introduction to Leibniz’s Monadology.
  • Simmons, Alison. "Changing the Cartesian Mind: Leibniz on Sensation, Representation and Consciousness." The Philosophical Review 110.1 (2001): 31-75.
    • Insightful discussion of the ways in which Leibniz’s philosophy of mind differs from the Cartesian view; also argues that Leibnizian consciousness consists in higher-order perceptions.
  • Sotnak, Eric. "The Range of Leibnizian Compatibilism." New Essays on the Rationalists. Eds. Rocco J. Gennaro and C. Huenemann. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. 200-223.
    • About Leibniz’s theory of freedom.
  • Swoyer, Chris. "Leibnizian Expression." Journal of the History of Philosophy 33 (1995): 65-99.
    • About Leibnizian perception.
  • Wilson, Margaret Dauler. "Confused Vs. Distinct Perception in Leibniz: Consciousness, Representation, and God's Mind." Ideas and Mechanism: Essays on Early Modern Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1999. 336-352.
    • About Leibnizian perception as well as perceptual distinctness.


Author Information

Julia Jorati
The Ohio State University
U. S. A.

Blaise Pascal (1623–1662)

pascal_blaiseBlaise Pascal was a French philosopher, mathematician, scientist, inventor, and theologian. In mathematics, he was an early pioneer in the fields of game theory and probability theory. In philosophy he was an early pioneer in existentialism. As a writer on theology and religion he was a defender of Christianity.

Despite chronic ill health, Pascal made historic contributions to mathematics and to physical science, including both experimental and theoretical work on hydraulics, atmospheric pressure, and the existence and nature of the vacuum. As a scientist and philosopher of science, Pascal championed strict empirical observation and the use of controlled experiments; he opposed the rationalism and logico-deductive method of the Cartesians; and he opposed the metaphysical speculations and reverence for authority of the theologians of the Middle Ages.

Although he never fully abandoned his scientific and mathematical interests, after his uncanny “Night of Fire” (the intense mystical illumination and midnight conversion that he experienced on the evening of November 23, 1654), Pascal turned his talents almost exclusively to religious writing.  It was during the period from 1656 until his death in 1662 that he wrote the Lettres Provinciales and the Pensées. The Lettres Provinciales is a satirical attack on Jesuit casuistry and a polemical defense of Jansenism. The Pensées is a posthumously published collection of unfinished notes for what was intended to be a systematic apologia for the Christian religion. Along with his scientific writings, these two great literary works have attracted the admiration and critical interest of philosophers and serious readers of every generation.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Early Years
    2. First Conversion
    3. Worldly Reversion
    4. Second Conversion
    5. Final Years
    6. Miracle of the Holy Thorn
  2. Literary and Religious Works
    1. Provincial Letters
    2. Pensées
      1. Plan and Purpose of the Work and its Textual History
      2. Philosophical Themes
      3. Between Misery and Grandeur
      4. Critical Approaches and Interpretation
      5. The Wager
    3. Minor Works (Opuscules)
      1. Writings on Grace
      2. On the Geometric Spirit
      3. Discourse on the Passions of Love
      4. Discourses on the Condition of the Great
      5. Prayer on the Proper Use of Sickness
      6. Pascal’s Conversation with M. de Saci on Epictetus and Montaigne
  3. Mathematical and Scientific Works
    1. Conic Sections
    2. Experiments on the Vacuum
    3. Pascal’s Triangle and Probability Theory
    4. Infinity
    5. Solving the Cycloid
  4. Philosophy of Science and Theory of Knowledge
    1. Philosophy of Science
    2. Theory of Knowledge
      1. Reason and Sense
      2. The Heart
  5. Fideism
  6. Existentialism
  7. Conclusion: Pascal’s Reputation and Cultural Legacy
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and translations of works by Pascal
    2. Biographical and critical studies

1. Biography

 “Pascal’s life is inseparable from his work.”—A. J. Krailsheimer

Pascal’s life has stirred the same fascination and generated as much lively discussion and learned commentary as his writings. This is largely attributable to his intriguing, enigmatic personality. To read him is to come into direct contact with both his strangeness and his charm. It is also to encounter a tangle of incongruities and seeming contradictions. For Pascal himself – humble yet forceful; fanatical as well as skeptical; mild and empathetic, yet also capable of withering scorn – personified the very “chimera” he famously declared man to be (Pensées, 131/164).  [Note: Throughout this article, fragments of the Pensées are identified first (that is, before the slash) by the numeration system of Lafuma and second (after the slash) by that of Sellier – L/S.]

Interest in his life is also due to our natural desire to learn more about this “scary genius” , or effrayant génie – Chateaubriand’s memorable phrase, whose unique combination of talents enabled him to make revolutionary contributions not only to mathematics and  physical science but also to the theology and literature of his age. Merely to list his achievements is once again to encounter Pascal the “chimera,”— the human riddle who was both an avant-garde crusader for empirical science as well as an avid supporter of ancient prophecy, mysticism, miracles, and Biblical hermeneutics. Modern readers are usually shocked to discover that the father of gambling odds and the mechanical computer wore a spiked girdle to chastise himself and further mortify a body already tormented by recurrent illness and chronic pain.

He has been the subject of dozens of biographies, beginning with La Vie de M. Pascal, the brief hagiographic sketch composed by his sister Gilberte Périer shortly after his death in 1662 and first published in 1684.  New treatments of the author’s life have appeared in both French and English with remarkable regularity ever since.

Périer’s memoir established a precedent by applying an underlying pattern and symmetry to her brother’s life. The implied form is that of a well-made play with classic five-act structure. In Périer’s treatment this life-drama is a divine comedy showing the spiritual rise and eventual salvation of a distressed soul who, after a series of trials and setbacks, reunites with God. Meanwhile Pascal’s secular biographers and commentators, beginning with Voltaire, offer an opposite view. They portray Pascal’s career as essentially a tragedy, a descending arc tracing the decline into timidity and superstition of a once bold and independent thinker. Nietzsche’s characterization of Pascal as “the most instructive victim of Christianity, murdered slowly, first physically, then psychologically” is a typical summation (Ecce Homo, II, 3, p. 243).

Both views are oversimplified. First of all, at no point during his lifetime was Pascal ever a libertine or libre-penseur. So portraying his life as though it consisted of two sudden and powerful “conversions,” with an intervening slide into worldliness and sins of the flesh, seems a bit too pat and melodramatic. Similarly, since Pascal was a lifelong supporter of the Catholic faith, and since he also maintained an interest in scientific and mathematical problems well after his commitment to Jansenism and Port-Royal, it seems unfair to portray his final years as a betrayal of his scientific principles rather than as an intensification or culmination of his religious views.  Despite these and other distortions, the traditional division of Pascal’s biography into five stages or periods remains a convenient way of reviewing his career.

a. Early Years

Blaise Pascal was born on June 19, 1623, in Clermont (now Clermont-Ferrand) in the Auvergne region of central France. His parents were Étienne Pascal (1588 – 1651), a magistrate, civil servant, and member of the aristocratic and professional class known as the noblesse de robe, and Antoinette Bégon Pascal (1596-1626), the daughter of a Clermont merchant. Pascal was named for his paternal uncle as well as for St. Blaise, the 3rd-century Armenian saint martyred by having his flesh flayed by iron carding combs as his namesake would later punish his own flesh by wearing a belt studded with sharp nails.

The Pascal family, including Pascal’s older sister Gilberte (b. 1620) and younger sister Jacqueline (b. 1625), enjoyed a comfortable, upper-bourgeois lifestyle. Étienne, in addition to being a lawyer, public official, and tax administrator, was proficient in Latin and Greek, a dabbler in natural philosophy, and an expert mathematician. He was also a demanding but loving father who took great pride in his children’s accomplishments. Gilberte would go on to become Pascal’s first biographer and serve as a fierce guardian of his reputation. Jacqueline displayed an early literary genius and earned acclaim as a poet and dramatist before becoming a nun at Port-Royal. Pascal’s mother, who was known for her piety and charitable work, died when Pascal was only three years old and Jacqueline was but an infant.

Pascal was a sickly child who suffered various pains and diseases throughout his life. According to a family anecdote related by his niece, at age one he supposedly fell victim to a strange illness. His abdomen became distended and swollen, and the slightest annoyance triggered fits of crying and screaming. This affliction supposedly continued for more than a year, and the child often seemed on the verge of death.

Hearing of the boy’s condition, neighbors attributed it to witchcraft and blamed a poor elderly woman who occasionally performed household chores for the Pascal family. Étienne, as an educated gentleman, at first scoffed at the accusation, but when his patience eventually wore thin he confronted the woman and threatened her with hanging if she didn’t come forward with the truth. The woman reportedly fell to the floor and promised to divulge everything if her life would be spared. She confessed that in a moment of anger and resentment she had cast a spell on the child – a fatal spell that could be undone only by having it transferred to some other living creature. Supposedly the family cat was given to her and made a scapegoat for the otherwise doomed child. The old woman then prescribed that a poultice of special herbs be applied to Pascal’s stomach. After an intense crisis, during which he appeared to be comatose and close to death, Pascal awoke from his “spell” and eventually recovered his health.

This strange and improbable “witch” tale is scarcely credible today. But that Pascal endured a serious and potentially fatal childhood illness during which his parents desperately tried all kinds of fanciful cures and treatments seems very likely. In fact, the anecdote is perfectly consistent with the wild and paradoxical world of 17th_ century culture and especially the medical practice of the time – a time when empirical science and natural magic, enlightened new techniques and antique superstitions, were routinely intermingled and practiced side by side.

The exact cause and basis of Pascal’s lifelong health problems have never been fully settled or accounted for. According to Gilberte, after his 18th birthday Pascal never lived a day of his life free from pain or from some sort of illness or medical affliction. The most common medical opinion is that he contracted gastrointestinal tuberculosis in early childhood and that manifestations of the disease, along with signs of possible concurrent nephritis or rheumatoid arthritis, recurred periodically throughout his lifetime. The accounts of his pathology are also consistent with migraine, irritable bowel syndrome, and fibromyalgia – a complex of illnesses often found together and which also frequently occur in combination with symptoms of anxiety, depression, and emotional distress.

Scholarly interest in this matter involves more than just idle curiosity and medical detective-work. The question of Pascal’s physical and mental health goes to the heart of desires to learn more about the conditions and circumstances that produce extraordinary genius. Affliction and disease, physical or emotional trauma, a natural disadvantage or disability have often served as an added motive or accelerator for high-level creative achievement. Examples abound – from the ancient legend of the blind and vagabond Homer to the documented histories of modern creative figures like Isaac Newton, Van Gogh, Stephen Hawking, and Christy Brown. We can only speculate whether and to what extent Pascal’s physical ailments and disabilities, instead of retarding his career, may have actually spurred and given rise to his intellectual triumphs.

In 1631, a few years after the death of his wife, Étienne sold his government post (a common practice of the day) along with most of his property and moved with his children to Paris. Over the next nine years he devoted himself to his amateur scientific and mathematical pursuits and took personal charge of his children’s education. Recognizing early on his son’s exceptional intellectual gifts, Étienne designed and supervised a special program and curriculum for the boy based on his own anti-scholastic and progressive educational principles.

Young Pascal was taught Latin and Greek as well as history, geography, and philosophy – all on an impromptu schedule, including during meals and at various hours throughout the day. Science, or natural philosophy as the discipline was then known, ignited Pascal’s imagination, and he demonstrated an early inquisitiveness about natural phenomena and a fondness for devising experiments. Civil and canon law were also part of a varied curriculum that included study of the Bible and the Church Fathers. The latter studies were in accordance with Étienne’s personal religious views, which were plain and respectful and as progressive as his views on education. He taught his son his own cardinal principle that whatever is a matter of faith should not also be treated as a matter of reason; and vice-versa. It is a tenet that Pascal took to heart and followed throughout his career.

In the belief that, once exposed to mathematics, his son would be so captivated by it that he would forsake or ignore his other studies, Étienne determined to withhold instruction in math and geometry until Pascal had completed the rest of his training. However, upon discovering that the boy had already achieved an intuitive understanding of the discipline including his own independently worked out demonstration of a proof in Euclid, Étienne acquiesced. The pages of Euclid were finally opened to the youth, and thus began Pascal’s belated introduction to mathematics – the subject with which he would conduct, at times guiltily, a lifelong love affair.

Pascal’s education was unique for his own time and would be unusual in any era. A passionate student who delved earnestly into each new subject, he absorbed new material, including, at a later period, the most arcane and technical components of theology quickly and effortlessly. However, his learning, while deep in a few areas, was never broad and was in some ways less remarkable for what it included than for what it left out.

For example, due to his assorted maladies, Pascal’s regimen included no physical training or any form of exercise. In addition, because of the sequestered, hermetic, entirely private form of his schooling, he never experienced any of the personal contacts or opportunities for social development that most young people, including even novice monks in monastic schools, commonly do. To what extent this may have deformed or limited his social and interpersonal skills it is hard to say. He was known to be temperamentally impatient with and demanding of others while sometimes seeming arrogant and self-absorbed. At a later point in his career, he fully acknowledged his deficiencies and indeed chastised himself for his social ambition and intellectual vanity.

Pascal was not widely read in the classics or in contemporary literature. Though he was well acquainted with Aristotelian and Scholastic thought, philosophy for him consisted mainly of Epictetus, Montaigne, and the traditional debate between Stoicism and Epicureanism. Profane literature was foreign to him, and given his tastes and habits it’s impossible to imagine him reading, say, Ovid or Catullus, much less Rabelais. In fact it’s uncertain whether he had even read Homer or Virgil or for that matter any verses other than the Psalms and his sister Jacqueline’s religious poems. As for drama, Corneille was a family friend who at one time personally championed Jacqueline’s poetry and dramaturgy, and the young Racine studied classical literature and rhetoric at the school at Port-Royal while Jacqueline and Pascal were also there. Yet Pascal never mentions the work of either great writer and indeed – other than to refer to the stage as a “dangerous diversion” (Pensées, 764/630) – seems to have taken little interest at all in contemporary French theatre, which was then at its artistic zenith.

But whatever he may have lacked in physical education, humanistic studies, and art appreciation, Pascal more than made up for in his favored pursuits. In fact, so rapidly did he advance in physics and mathematics that Étienne boldly introduced the boy at the age of only thirteen into his small Parisian academic circle known as the Académie libre. The central figure of this group was the polymathic philosopher, mathematician, theologian, and music theorist Père Marin Mersenne, one of the leading intellectuals of the age. Mersenne corresponded with Descartes, Huygens, Hobbes, and other luminaries of the period and actively promoted the work of controversial thinkers like Galileo and Gassendi. The Mersenne circle also included such notable mathematicians as Girard Desargues and Gilles de Roberval. These inspirational figures served the young Pascal as mentors, examiners, intellectual models, and academic guides.

It was during his involvement with the Mersenne circle that Pascal published, at age sixteen, his Essai pour les Coniques, an important contribution to the relatively new field of projective geometry. The essay includes an original proof concerning the special properties of hexagons inscribed within conic sections that is still known today as Pascal’s Theorem.

Around the same time that Pascal was working on his Theorem, Étienne, who had at one time served as an adviser to Cardinal Richelieu, incurred the wrath of the First Minister by leading a protest over a government bond default. Threatened with prison, he sought refuge in Auvergne. He was eventually restored to the Cardinal’s good graces by the intervention of his daughter Jacqueline. (The Cardinal, a patron of the theatre, was charmed not only by Jacqueline’s poetic and dramatic skills but also by her beauty and courtly manners.) It’s also likely that Richelieu had an additional motive for welcoming Étienne back. For no sooner was Étienne returned to royal favor than Richelieu appointed him the chief tax administrator for Rouen. At the Cardinal’s behest, the Pascal family moved from Paris to Rouen in early January of 1640.

Rouen was a city in crisis, beset by street violence, crop failures, a tax revolt, and an outbreak of plague. It was Étienne’s job to handle the taxpayer revolt, which he eventually managed to do by working with the local citizens and earning their confidence and respect. Pascal meanwhile seems to have been little affected by the change of scene and continued with his mathematical studies. He also undertook a new project. Impressed by the massive number of calculations required in his father’s work of accounting and tax assessment, he wondered if the drudgery of such labor might not be relieved by some type of mechanical device. Setting to work on the idea in 1642, he eventually conceived, designed, and oversaw the construction of what was presented to the public in 1645 as la machine arithmétique, later known as the Pascaline. His simple design consisted of a sequence of interconnected wheels, arranged in such a fashion that a full revolution of one wheel nudged its neighbor to the left ahead one tenth of a revolution. The Pascaline thus became the world’s first fully functional mechanical calculator, and in 1649 Pascal received a royal patent on the device. Over the next five years he continued tinkering with his design, experimenting with various materials and trying out different linkage arrangements and gear mechanisms. Nine working models survive today and serve as a reminder that Pascal was not just a mathematical Platonist absorbed in a higher world of pure number but also a practical minded, down-to-earth engineering type interested in applying the insights of science and mathematics to the solution of real-world problems.

b. First Conversion

On an icy day in January of 1646, Étienne Pascal, in his capacity as a public official, was summoned to prevent a duel that was to take place in a field outside Rouen. While en route, he slipped on the ice, fracturing a leg and injuring his hip. The family called in two local bonesetters, the brothers Deschamps, who moved into the Pascal household for a period of three months to care for Étienne and oversee his recovery. The brothers turned out to be members of the small, saintly community of Augustinian worshippers established at Port-Royal by the Jansenist priest Jean du Vergier de Hauranne, more simply known as the abbé Saint-Cyran.

The Jansenists (named for the Dutch theologian Cornelius Jansen) accepted the strict Augustinian creed that salvation is achieved not by human virtue or merit but solely by the grace of God. At Port-Royal they practiced an ascetic lifestyle emphasizing penance, austerity, devotional exercises, and good works. While treating Étienne, the Deschamps brothers shared their stringent, exacting, and somewhat cheerless religious views with the Pascal family. Pascal himself, along with his father and sisters, had never displayed much in the way of genuine religious fervor. They were good upper-middle-class Catholics, mild and respectful in their beliefs rather than zealous, neither God-fearing nor, to any extraordinary degree, God-seeking. Yet the ardor of the Deschamps brothers proved contagious. Pascal caught the fire and read with avidity the Jansenist texts that were given to him – sermons by Saint-Cyran along with doctrinal works by Augustine, Antoine Arnauld (Saint-Cyran’s successor), and Jansen himself. Gradually, with growing assurance, and eventually with complete sincerity and conviction, Pascal embraced the Jansenist creed. According to Gilberte’s account, he was the first in the family to convert to the new faith, and no sooner had he done so than he set about to convert the rest of family, first Jacqueline, then Étienne, and finally Gilberte and her husband Florin Périer. It should be added, however, that from Pascal’s own point of view he wasn’t so much “converting” to Jansenism, or any particular group or sect, as he was declaring or reaffirming his commitment to the true faith.

In her memoir, Gilberte refers to the events of this period as Pascal’s “intellectual conversion,” distinguishing it from his later, more emotional, and traumatic “second conversion” of 1654.  She also asserts that at this time Pascal formally renounced all his scientific and mathematical researches and ever afterward devoted himself entirely and exclusively to the love and service of God. This claim is inaccurate and indeed hard to fathom given that only a year later Florin Périer, Gilberte’s own husband, assisted in what is probably Pascal’s most famous scientific investigation, the celebrated Puy-de-Dôme experiment measuring air pressure and proving the existence of the vacuum. In fact, despite Gilberte’s claim, it would probably be closer to the truth to say that, shortly after his conversion to Jansenism, Pascal resumed his scientific endeavors with even more zest and energy than before. In the spring of 1947, partly on the advice of his physicians, he returned to Paris where he linked up once again with former colleagues and began organizing several new essays and treatises for publication. His supposed renunciation of natural philosophy and the bright world of Parisian intellectual life had lasted all of six months.

c. Worldly Reversion

Contrary to Gilberte’s account, most biographers have accepted the years 1649 -1654 as a periode mondaine in Pascal’s career – that is, as a time when he retreated from his pledge to serve only God and resumed to a significant degree the life of a gentleman-scientist.

It was not a period of debauchery and libertinism or anything of the kind. Although he showed an occasional weakness for silk and brocade and enjoyed the amenities of both a valet and a coach-and-six, Pascal did not become a salon habitué or even much of a bon vivant. He was simply a young man who sought the company of fellow experts, savored the spotlight of recognition for personal achievement, and delighted in the social world of learned conversation and sparkling intellectual debate. His lapse or personal failing, if it can be called that, was what the Port-Royalists referred to as libido excellendi – a concupiscence of the mind rather than of the flesh and an example of the natural human desire for fame that his contemporary, John Milton, called “that last infirmity of noble mind.”

Pascal’s companions during this period included such stars of the Paris social scene as Artus Gouffier, the Duc de Roannez, a former military officer, noted courtier, and amateur dabbler in science and mathematics; Antoine Gombaud, the Chevalier de Méré, a soldier, gambler, author, and paragon of honnêteté (more than mere “honesty,” this term connotes an entire code of conduct and the gallant, cheerful lifestyle of an independent-minded man of the world); and Damien Mitton, another champion of honnêteté whose name became a byword for debonair charm and colorful raconteurship. Several commentators on the Pensées argue that the work is directly aimed at the culture of honnêteté and that it specifically targets figures like Méré and Mitton, that is, persons who seek a life of virtue and happiness apart from God.

Shortly after his return to Paris in 1647 and during a turn for the worse in his health, Pascal reunited with his old circle of friends and fellow intellectuals and was also introduced into polite society. Descartes himself paid a visit (and according to reports wisely suggested that Pascal follow a regimen of bed-rest and bouillon rather than the steady diet of enemas, purgings, and blood-lettings favored by his doctors). The historic meeting between the two scientific and philosophical rivals reportedly did not go well.

Pascal’s new life in Paris was interrupted in 1648 by the outbreak of the Fronde, the violent civil clash that began as a power struggle between Chief Minister Mazurin and leaders of Parliament and which continued as a conflict between the crown and various aristocratic factions over the next five years. To escape the mob havoc and pervasive military presence in Paris, Pascal returned to Clermont along with his sisters, brother-in-law, and father. There he effectively inserted himself into the Auvergne equivalent of Parisian high society and resumed his temporary infatuation with la vie honnêteté. He returned to Paris in 1650, reconnected with his old friends, and began revising and polishing several scientific papers, including portions of a never completed or partially lost version of his Treatise on the Vacuum.

On September 24, 1651, Étienne died; he was 63. Pascal and Jacqueline were at his bedside. Gilberte was in Clermont awaiting the birth of a child who would be named Étienne Périer in honor of his grandfather. Pascal’s letter of consolation to Gilberte, preserved among his complete works, has disappointed some of his admirers due to its austere tone and cold Jansenist view of death (we should not grieve but rejoice at God’s will; the deceased is now in a better world; and so forth.). However, the letter includes a note of affection for the man who had taken personal charge of his education and who was the first to introduce him to the world of science and mathematics. Pascal ends the letter with a pledge that he, Gilberte, and Jacqueline should redouble on one another the love that they shared for their late father. A few months later, Jacqueline finally made good on her determination (long postponed in obedience to her father’s and brother’s wishes) to dedicate her life to holy service and enter Port-Royal as a nun.

In the summer of 1654 Pascal exchanged a series of letters with Fermat on the problem of calculating gambling odds and probabilities. It was also at this time (although many have doubted his authorship) that he completed his Discourse on Love. And according to at least two of his biographers (Faugère and Bishop) it was during this same period (1653-54) that Pascal himself fell victim to amorous passion and even contemplated marriage (supposedly to the comely Charlotte de Rouannez, his frequent correspondent and the sister of his good friend the Duke). On the other hand, Gilberte in her account of her brother’s life makes no mention whatsoever of a love affair, and the evidence that Pascal ever succumbed to romance or became a suitor remains sketchy at best.

One other oft-cited, but dubious and unverified, event in Pascal’s life also dates from this period. According to various sources, none wholly reliable, in October of 1654, Pascal was supposedly involved in a nearly fatal accident while crossing the Pont de Neuilly in his coach. His affrighted horses reportedly reared, bolted, and plunged over the side of the bridge into the Seine, nearly dragging the coach and Pascal after them. Fortunately, the main coupling broke and the coach, with Pascal inside, miraculously hung on to the edge and stabilized.

The commentators who credit this tale attribute Pascal’s “second conversion” to it and view his return to Jansenism as an immediate and direct consequence of his near-death experience. Sigmund Freud accepted the story and even used it as an example of how severe trauma can trigger an obsessive or phobic reaction. However, there is no conclusive evidence that the event ever happened.

d. Second Conversion

The crucial event of Pascal’s life and career occurred on November 23, 1654, between the hours of 10:30 pm and 12:30 am. Pascal lay in bed at his home in the Marais district in Paris when he experienced the religious ecstasy or revelation that his biographers refer to as his “second conversion” or “night of fire.” He produced a written record of this momentous experience on a sheet of paper, which he then inserted into a piece of folded parchment inscribed with a duplicate account of the same vision. This dual record, known as the Memorial, he kept sewed into the lining of his jacket as a kind of secret token or private testament of his new life and total commitment to Jesus Christ. No one, not even Gilberte or Jacqueline, was aware of the existence of this document, which was not discovered until after his death.

The text of the Memorial is cryptic, ejaculatory, portentous. At the top of the sheet stands a cross followed by a few lines establishing the time and date, then the word FEU (fire) in all upper case and centered near the top of the page. Then:

Dieu d'Abraham, Dieu d'Isaac, Dieu de Jacob, non des philosophes et des savants.

Certitude. Certitude. Sentiment. Joie. Paix.

Dieu de Jésus-Christ.

Deum meum et Deum vestrum.

Ton Dieu sera mon Dieu.

(God of Abraham, God of Isaac, God of Jacob, not of the philosophers and scholars. Certitude, certitude, feeling, joy, peace. God of Jesus Christ. My God and your God. Thy God will be my God.)

And so on, in a similarly ecstatic vein for about eighteen more lines. The parchment copy ends with the solemn pledge: “Total submission to Jesus Christ and to my director. Eternally in joy for a day’s trial on earth. I shall not forget thy word.”

As the name Memorial implies, Pascal’s words were written down to preserve them indelibly in his memory and to bear tangible witness to what was for him a soul-piercing and truly life-altering event. His account, despite its brevity and gnomic style, accords closely with the reports of conversion and mysticism classically described and analyzed by William James.

In the weeks leading up to November 23, 1654, Pascal had on several occasions visited Jacqueline at Port-Royal and had complained, despite his active social life and ongoing scientific work, of feelings of dissatisfaction, guilt, lack of purpose, and ennui. As in the story of his carriage accident by the Seine, he seemed to be a man teetering on the edge – in this case between anxiety and hope. His “Night of Fire” dramatically changed his outlook and brought him back from the brink of despair.

e. Final Years

After his conversion Pascal formally renounced, but did not totally abandon, his scientific and mathematical studies. He instead vowed to dedicate his time and talents to the glorification of God, the edification of his fellow believers, and the salvation of the larger human community. It wasn’t long before he got an early test of his new resolve.

In fact, hardly had Pascal committed himself to Port-Royal than the Jansenist enclave, never secure and always under the watchful suspicion of the greater Catholic community, found itself under theological siege.  Antoine Arnauld, the spiritual leader of Port-Royal and the uncompromising voice and authority for its strict Augustinian beliefs and values, was embroiled in a bitter controversy pitting Jansenism against the Pope, the Jesuit order, and a majority of the bishops of France. In effect, opponents charged that the entire Jansenist system was based on a foundation of error. At issue were matters of Catholic doctrine involving grace, election, human righteousness, divine power, and free will. Arnauld denied the charges and published a series of vehement counter-attacks. Unfortunately, these only served to make the hostility towards himself and the Port-Royal community more intense. He ended up being censored by the Faculty of Theology at the Sorbonne and stood threatened with official accusations of heresy. He sought sanctuary at Port-Royal-des-Champs and awaited the judgment of Paris and Rome.

With the official voice of Port-Royal effectively muted, the cause of Jansenism needed a new champion. Pascal stood ready to fill the role. During the period 1656-57, under the pseudonym Louis de Montalte,

he produced a series of 18 public letters attacking the Jesuits and defending Arnauld and Jansenist doctrine. The Lettres provinciales, as they became known, introduced an entirely new tone and style into contemporary theological debate. From time to time, the genre had served as a forum for obfuscation, vituperation, abstruse technical language, and stodgy academic prose. Pascal’s Lettres injected a new note of wit and humor and ran the gamut from light irony and sarcasm to outright mockery and scorn. They also featured a popular idiom and conversational tone and made use of literary devices such as characterization, dialog, dramatization, and narrative voice. They became a sensation and attracted the amused attention of readers throughout France. Who, people wondered, is this clever fellow Montalte? The Jesuits, stunned and slow to respond, seemed to have met their intellectual match.

f. Miracle of the Holy Thorn

During the same week that Pascal’s fifth provinciale (a polemic against Jesuit casuistry) was published, and just when rumors of new antagonism and royal disfavor with Jansenism began to circulate, an extraordinary event occurred at Port-Royal. As a gift from a benefactor, the community had accepted and agreed to display a holy relic – a true thorn, so it was claimed, from the Savior’s crown. Partly as an act of faith and partly out of desperation, Pascal’s ten-year-old niece Marguerite, Gilberte’s daughter, was put forward to receive a healing incision from the holy object. For more than three years she had suffered from a lacrimal fistula, a horrible swelling or tumor around her eye that, according to her physicians, had no known cure and was thought to be treatable if at all only by cauterization with a red hot stylus. Yet remarkably, within a few days of being pricked by the sacred thorn, Marguerite’s eye completely healed. The seeming miracle excited the Pascal family and the entire Port-Royal community; news of the event soon spread outside the walls of Port-Royal and around the nation. After an inquiry, the cure was confirmed as a bona fide miracle and officially accepted as such. Port-Royal rejoiced, and for a while the antagonism against it from the larger Catholic community abated. Pascal regarded the miracle as a sign of divine favor for his Lettres project and for the cause of Jansenism in general. It also confirmed his belief in miracles, a belief that would form part of the foundation for his view of religious faith as set forth in the Pensées.  

Despite the auspicious sign of heavenly favor, and even though the Lettres were brilliantly successful in the short term, they failed in their ultimate goal of vindicating Arnauld and Port-Royal. A papal “bull” condemning Jansenism was issued by Alexander VII in October of 1656 and approved in France in December of 1657. An official oath decreeing that Jansenist doctrine was contaminated by heresy was circulated and all French priests, monks, and nuns, including the Port-Royalists and Pascal’s sister Jacqueline, were compelled to sign. In 1660 the “little schools” of Port Royal, renowned for excellence and models of progressive education, were closed. In 1661 the monastery was no longer allowed to accept novices. Early in the next century the abbey would be abolished, the community of worshippers disbanded, and the buildings razed. Overwhelmed by a combined force of royal politics and papal power, Port-Royal would lie in ruins and Jansenism, though it would inspire a few random offshoots and latter-day imitations, would find itself largely reduced to an interesting but brief chapter in the history of French Catholicism.

Meanwhile, in the spring of 1658, as he was studying the Bible and doing preparatory work for what was to be his magnum opus – the great Apology for Christianity that would become the Pensées – Pascal turned his attention once again to mathematics and to the problem of the roulette or cycloid. Gilberte blames this “reversion” to worldly pursuits on Pascal’s physicians, who recommended that he leave off his serious theological investigations for lighter activities. She also claims that the solution to the problem, which had challenged the likes of Galileo, Torricelli, and Descartes, came to him almost despite himself and during a bout of sleeplessness caused by a toothache. She finally alleges that Pascal decided to make his discovery public only when he was at length persuaded by others that it was God’s will. Gilberte’s claims are questionable. What is known is that when Pascal, under the pseudonym Amos Dettonville, actually did publish his solution, which was done within the context of a contest or challenge that he had thrown out to some of the best mathematical minds of Europe, the result was a controversy that occupied his time and energy for several months and which distracted him from working on his new project.

The Pensées occupied Pascal’s final years and were undertaken at a time when his health, which was never robust, deteriorated and grew progressively worse. Originally conceived as a comprehensive defense of the Christian faith against non-believers, the work in its existing form is a rich assortment of notes, fragments, aphorisms, homilies, short essays, sermonettes, and aperçus that even in their disorganized and unfinished state constitute a powerful and fascinating contribution to philosophy, theology, and literary art.

Pascal worked determinedly on the Pensées to the extent that his health permitted him, which was unfortunately not very often or for very long. By early 1659 he was already seriously ill and could work for only short spurts before succumbing to mental and physical exhaustion. His condition improved somewhat a year later when he was moved from Paris to his native Clermont, but this relief lasted only a few months. When he returned to Paris he mustered enough energy to work out his plan for a public shuttle system of omnibuses for the city. When this novel idea was realized and put into actual operation in 1662, Paris had the first such transit system in the world.

The last two years of Pascal’s life were spent in Paris under the care and supervision of Gilberte and Florin, who had taken a home nearby. It was a grim period for all the Pascals; Jacqueline died in 1661, only a few months after being forced to subscribe to the formulary condemning Jansen’s Augustinus as heretical. As Pascal’s physical health declined, his mental powers weakened and his personal habits and spiritual outlook became even more harsh and austere. According to Gilberte, he regarded any sort of dining pleasure or gastronomic delight as a hateful form of sensuality and adopted the (very un-Gallic) view that one should eat strictly for nourishment and not for enjoyment. He championed the ideal of poverty and claimed that one should prefer and use goods crafted by the poorest and most honest artisans, not those manufactured by the best and most accomplished. He purged his home of luxuries and pretty furnishings and took in a homeless family. He even cautioned Gilberte not to be publicly affectionate with her children – on grounds that caresses can be a form of sensuality, dependency, and self-indulgence. In his opinion, a life devoted to God did not allow for close personal attachments – not even to family.

During his last days he burned with fever and colic. His doctors assaulted him with their customary cures. He wavered in and out of consciousness and suffered a series of recurrent violent convulsions. However, Gilberte attests that he recovered his clarity of mind in time to make a final confession, take the Blessed Sacrament, and receive extreme unction. His last coherent words were reportedly “May God never abandon me.” He died at 1:00 AM August 19, 1662, at the age of 39.

Even post-mortem Pascal was unable to escape the curiosity and intrusiveness of his physicians. Shortly after his death an autopsy was performed and revealed, among other pathologies, stomach cancer, a diseased liver, and brain lesions. Nor after death, was he granted peace from the still ongoing crossfire between Jesuits and Port-Royal. Was Pascal, it was asked, truly orthodox and a good Catholic? A sincere believer and supporter of the powers of the Pope and the priesthood and the efficacious intervention of the Saints? Did he reject the Jansenist heresy on his deathbed and accept a more moderate and forgiving theology? Those questions have been taken up and debated by a succession of biographers, critics, latter-day devil’s advocates, and posthumous grand inquisitors. His works have fared better, having received, during the three and a half centuries since his death, first-rate editorial attention, a number of superb translations, and an abundance of expert scholarly commentary. The Pensées and the Provincial Letters have earned him a place in the pantheon of French philosophical non-fiction alongside names like Montaigne, Descartes, Voltaire, Rousseau, and Sartre.

2. Literary and Religious Works

a. Provincial Letters

Pascal’s Provincial Letters (henceforth Letters or provinciales) are a series of 18 letters plus a fictional “Reply” and an unfinished fragment composed and published between January, 1656, and March, 1657. Their aim was to defend the Jansenist community of Port-Royal and its principal spokesman and spiritual leader Antoine Arnauld from defamation and accusations of heresy while at the same time leading a counter-offensive against the accusers (mainly the Jesuits). Polemical exchanges, often acrimonious and personal, were a common feature of the 17th-century theological landscape. Pascal ventured into this particular fray with a unique set of weapons – a mind honed by mathematical exercise and scientific debate, a pointed wit, and sharp-edged literary and dramatic skills.

In the background of the letters stand two notable events:  (1) In May of 1653, Pope Innocent X in a bull entitled Cum Occasione declared five propositions supposedly contained in Cornelius Jansen’s Augustinus to be heretical.  (2) In January of 1656, after a long and heated trial, Arnauld, who had repeatedly denied that the five propositions were in Jansen’s text, was officially censured and expelled from the Sorbonne.

The five propositions can be stated as follows:

1. Even the just, no matter how hard they may strive, lack the power and grace to keep all the commandments.

2. In our fallen condition it is impossible for us to resist interior grace.

3. In order to deserve merit or condemnation we must be free from external compulsion though not from internal necessity.

4. It is heresy to say that we can either accept grace or resist it.

5. Christ did not die for everyone, but only for the elect.

Two separate questions were at stake: (1) Are the propositions actually in Jansen, if not explicitly and verbatim, then implicitly in meaning or intention? This was the so-called question of fact (de fait). (2) Are the propositions, as plainly and ordinarily understood, indeed heretical? This was the question of right or law (de droit). The Port-Royal position was yes in the case of the second question, no in the case of the first. Arnauld claimed that the propositions do not occur, verbatim or otherwise, anywhere in Jansen’s text, but he acknowledged that if they did occur there (or for that matter anywhere), they were indeed heretical. Despite the fact that he disavowed any support for the five propositions, he and the Port-Royal community as a whole stood under suspicion of secretly approving, if not openly embracing them.

Such was the situation that Pascal found himself in when he sat down to compose the first provinciale. What he produced was something utterly new in the annals of religious controversy. In place of the usual fury and technical quibbling, he adopts a tone of easy-going candor and colloquial simplicity. He presents himself as a modest, ordinary, private citizen (originally anonymous, but later identified in the collected letters by the pseudonym Louis de Montalte) who is writing from Paris to a “provincial friend.” “Montalte’s” purpose is to pass along his personal observations, insights, and commentary on the learned and mighty disputes that recently took place at the Sorbonne. In essence, via his fictional persona, Pascal provides an account of l’affaire Arnauld and the case against Jansenism as viewed by a coolly observant, playful outsider.

In the course of the letter, Pascal/Montalte introduces a series of fictional interlocutors who explain or advocate for the Jansenist, Jesuit, and Thomistic views on a range of theological issues, most notably the doctrines of sufficient grace vis-à-vis efficacious grace and the notion of proximate power. These happen to be exactly the sort of deeply esoteric, highly technical, theological matters that “Montalte” and his “provincial friend” (and thus, by extension and more importantly, his target audience of plain-spoken, commonsense, fellow citizens) were likely to find strained, incomprehensible, and somewhat silly. Through devices of interview and dialogue Montalte manages to present these issues in relatively clear, understandable terms and persuade the reader that the Jansenist and Thomist views on each are virtually identical and perfectly orthodox. He goes on to show that any apparent discrepancy between the two positions – and in fact the whole attack on Jansenism and Arnauld – is based not on doctrine, but is entirely political and personal, a product of Jesuit calumny and conspiracy.  In effect, a complicated theological conflict is presented in the form of a simple human drama. Irony and stinging satire are delivered with the suave aplomb of a Horatian epistle.

Not all of the provinciales deal with the same issues and concerns as the first. Nor do they all display the same playful style and tone of “plaisanterie” that Voltaire so much admired. In fact some of the later letters, far from being breezy and affable, are passionate and achieve sublime eloquence; others are downright vicious and blistering in their attack. Letters 1-3 offer a defense of Arnauld, challenging his trial and censure. Letter 4, pitting a Jesuit against a Jansenist, serves as a bridge between provinciales 1-3 and 5-10. Letters 5-10 attack Jesuit casuistry and doctrine; in them Montalte accuses the Society of hypocrisy and moral laxity and of placing ease of conscience and the glory of the Order above true Christian duty and love of God. Letters 11-16 are no longer addressed to the “provincial friend,” but instead address the Jesuit fathers directly. Letter 14 includes an extended discussion of both natural and divine law and makes an important ethical distinction between homicide, capital punishment, and suicide. Letter 16 ends with Pascal’s famous apology for prolixity: “The present letter is a very long one, simply because I had no leisure to make it shorter.”) Letters 17 and 18 are addressed to Father Annat, SJ, confessor to the King, and are direct and personal. Here Pascal virtually abandons the artifice of “Montalte” and seems almost to come forward in his own person. In Letter 17, a virtual reprise and summation of the case of the five propositions, he repeats once again that he writes purely as a private citizen and denies that he is a member of Port Royal. Since Pascal was neither a monk nor a solitaire within the community, the claim is technically accurate, though it arguably leaves him open to the same charges of truth-bending and casuistry that he levels against the Jesuits.

Although the Letters gained a wide readership and enjoyed a period of popular success, they failed to achieve their strategic goal of preserving Port-Royal and Jansenist doctrine from external attack. They also had a few unfortunate, unintended consequences. They were blamed, for instance, for stirring up cynicism, disrespect, and even contempt for the clergy in the minds of ordinary citizens. Quickly translated into English and Latin, they also became popular with Protestant readers happy to extend Pascal’s wounding attack on Jesuit morality into a satirical broadside against Catholicism as a whole. After the publication of the provinciales, the term Jesuitical would become synonymous with crafty and subtle and the words casuistry and casuistical would never again be entirely free from a connotation of sophistry and excuse-making. Banned by order of Louis XIV in 1660 and placed on the Index and burned by the Inquisition, the provinciales nevertheless lived on underground and abroad with their popularity undimmed.

Today, the provinciales retain documentary value both as relics of Jansenism and as surviving specimens of 17th-century religious polemic, but modern readers prize them mainly for their literary excellence. They represent the original model not only for the genre of satirical non-fiction, but for classic French prose style in all other genres as well. Rabelais and Montaigne were basically inimitable and far too quirky and idiosyncratic to serve as a style model for later writers. Pascal’s combination of brisk clarity and concise elegance set a pattern for French authors from La Rochefoucauld, Voltaire, and Diderot to Anatole France. Even Paul Valéry, arguably Pascal’s most severe critic, excoriated his predecessor in a prose style heavily indebted to him. Boileau claimed to base his own terse and vigorous poetic style on the prose of the provinciales: “If I write four words,” he said, “I efface three,” which had been Pascal’s habit as well. Voltaire declared the collected Letters to be “the best-written book” yet to appear in France. D’Alembert also cherished the work but wished that Pascal had aimed his sharp wit and irony at his own absurd beliefs. He argued that Jansenism is every bit as “shocking,” and as deserving of scorn and ridicule, as the doctrines of Molina and the Jesuits. Of Pascal’s modern readers only the arch conservative Joseph de Maistre, spearhead of the counter-Enlightenment, utterly scorned the work, calling Jansenism a “vile” and “unblushing” heresy and finding the style of the Letters rancorous and bitter.

In the end, it’s unfortunate that the principal debate in the provinciales was theological rather than philosophical, for it would have been useful and interesting to have Pascal’s candid discussion of free will vs. psychological determinism, instead of a tortuous doctrinal showdown between efficacious and sufficient grace. Jansen’s own formula – that “man irresistibly, although voluntarily, does either good or evil, according as he is dominated by grace or by concupiscence” – is paradoxical and tries to have it both ways. (Can an act be both voluntary and irresistible?) Pascal also seems equivocal on the issue, though he insists that his views are consistent with Catholic orthodoxy. He wrestled with the problem of grace and free will not only in the Letters, but also in portions of the Pensées and especially in his Écrits sur la grâce (1657-58), where he offers an extensive commentary on Augustine and compares the Calvinist, Jansenist, and Jesuit views. However, even there his account is abstruse and theological rather than blunt and philosophical and is thus of interest mainly to specialists rather than general readers.

b. Pensées

i. Plan and Purpose of the Work and its Textual History

The Pensées are a rarity among literary and philosophical works – a magnum opus by a major author that has achieved classic status despite being unfinished, fragmentary, and almost scrapbook-like in form. The Aeneid, The Canterbury Tales, De Rerum Natura, Kafka’s manuscripts all had work remaining or were incomplete when their authors died, but they seem like final drafts compared to the Pensées. Sainte-Beuve compared the work to a tower in which the stones have been piled up but not cemented. The text, as we have it today, represents the assembled notes, fragments, miscellaneous aphorisms, and short essays-in-progress of what was to be a detailed and comprehensive Apology for Christianity – a defense of the faith against atheism, deism, libertinism, pagan philosophy, and the cult of honnêteté.

Inspired by the force and certainty of his own conversion and by the late excitement of the Holy Thorn, Pascal was further encouraged by the recent success of the provinciales. Confident in his powers of argument and persuasion, both logical and literary, he felt called upon to undertake a bold new project. The new work was to be nothing less than a definitive affirmation and justification of Christianity against its detractors and critics. It would also be an exercise in spiritual outreach and proselytization – an earnest appeal, addressed to both the reason and the heart, inviting scoffers, doubters, the undecided, and the lost to join the Catholic communion. In the Pensées, Pascal would assume the role of both Apologist and Apostle.

In the spring of 1658, he presented a detailed outline of his project, explaining its scope and goals, to an audience of friends and members of Port-Royal. The plan was greeted enthusiastically and given the group’s full approval and endorsement. The work would be unified, but layered and textured, with multiple sections and two main parts:

First part: Misery of man without God.

Second part: Happiness of man with God.


First part: That nature is corrupt. Proved by nature itself.

Second part: That there is a Redeemer. Proved by Scripture. (6/40).

The project was designed as an example of what is today termed immanent apologetics. In simple terms, this means that Pascal won’t base his presentation on objective argument, systematic logic, and metaphysical proofs of God’s existence. Indeed, except for a few instances, such as 135/167, where he finds evidence in nature for a Being who is “necessary, infinite, and eternal,” Pascal eschews most of the traditional proofs of God, even Augustine’s. He will instead appeal to the unfolding history of the Christian faith from its roots in Old Testament prophecy through its early development to the modern Church. Further, he will appeal directly to the subjective human spirit and to each reader’s personal experience, emphasizing our existential human need for God and our feelings of incompleteness and wretchedness apart from Him.

In essence, Pascal will leave it to readers to decide whether his account of the human condition and his descriptions of their social and physical worlds (not as they might wish them to be, but as they actually experience them in our daily lives) are credible and persuasive. If the reader accepts his accounts, Pascal will be halfway to his goal. It will remain for him to further convince readers that the solution to our wretchedness, to the disorder and unfairness of life, is acceptance of Jesus Christ. He will argue that not only is belief in Christianity not contrary to reason, but that it’s the only religion that is fully compatible with it. To support this claim, he will offer historical evidence in its favor from the authority of Scripture and ancient witnesses, and also in the form of miracles, prophecies, and figural (typological) hermeneutics. However, he admits that this evidence will not be conclusive – for Christianity can never be proved by reason or authority alone. It must be accepted in the heart (coeur – a special term in Pascal’s vocabulary that includes connotations of “spirit,” “soul,” “natural human instinct,” and even “love,”): “It is the heart which experiences God, and not the reason. This, then, is faith: God felt by the heart, not by the reason” (424/680).

Such in essence was the plan. Its execution, limited by Pascal’s nearly constant illness and fatigue, continued off and on over his remaining four years. Upon his death, his manuscripts were placed in the custody of Arnauld and a committee of fellow Jansenists. While transcribing the manuscripts, the committee produced two variant copies. The original Port Royal edition of Pascal’s works came out in 1670, incomplete and carefully screened to avoid offending the government. Prosper Faugère brought out a revised and authoritative edition of the work in 1844. Several new editions, with different arrangements of the material, appeared over the next century. The numerical ordering used in Léon Brunschvicg’s 1897 edition became standard, but was superseded first by the 1951 edition of Louis Lafuma (which was based on the First Copy) and then again by the 1976 edition of Phillipe Sellier (which was based on the Second Copy). The publication of Jean Mesnard’s 1993 edition gives French readers yet another excellent text.

ii. Philosophical Themes

Death, God, infinity, the nature of the universe, the limits of reason, the meaning of life – these are just a few of the big ideas and philosophical topics that Pascal reflects on in the short space of the Pensées. Indeed, other than the gnomic fragments of Heraclitus or the terse aphoristic texts of Wittgenstein, it’s hard to think of a work that packs as many provocative philosophical musings into so few pages.

Yet even with its multiple subject headings and wide range of topics, the work can still be read as the deep exploration of a single great theme: the Human Condition, viewed under its two opposing yet interrelated aspects – our wretchedness without God, and our greatness with Him. Pascal argues that without God our spiritual condition is essentially a state of misery characterized by anxiety, alienation, loneliness, and ennui.  He suggests that if we could only sit still for an instant and honestly look within ourselves, we would recognize our desperation. However, we spend most of our time blocking out or concealing our true condition from ourselves via forms of self-deception and amour-propre. (Like Augustine before him, Pascal accurately describes mechanisms of denial and ego-defense long before they were clinically and technically defined by Sigmund Freud).

Chief among these ego-protective devices is divertissement (distraction or diversion), Pascal’s term for our continual need and almost addictive tendency to seek out mindless or soul-numbing forms of entertainment and amusement. Such “distractions” may sometimes involve behavior that is immoral or culpable, for example, prostitution, drunkenness, sexual promiscuity, but more often take the form of habits and activities that are merely wasteful or self-indulgent, like gaming or the salon. They may even consist of pastimes that are basically innocent, but which are nevertheless vain, trivial, or unedifying, for example, sports like tennis and fencing. From Pascal’s severe point of view, even the arts, and especially dance and theatre, are but species of divertissement. So are all the luxuries, consumer goods, and worldly delights with which we proudly surround ourselves. According to Pascal, we use these goods and activities not, as we self-flatteringly suppose, to certify our achievements or add a touch of bonheur to our inner life. On the contrary, we use them mainly as a way of concealing our bleak inner reality from ourselves and from one another. They are a means of denying our own mortality and hollowness.  (136/168; 139/171.)

iii. Between Misery and Grandeur

In effect diversions prevent us from acknowledging our essential misery.  They create a false sense of security that hides the abyss or vacuum within. On the other hand, wretchedness and insecurity are only part of our nature. Our condition, as Pascal points out repeatedly in the Pensées and also in his “conversation” with Sacy, is dual.  We are one part misery and one part grandeur; and alongside our feelings of isolation and destitution we also have a profound sense of our intrinsic dignity and worth. Pascal calls us “thinking reeds,” though his stress is on thinking. For thought, he argues, is the whole basis of our dignity, the attribute of our nature that elevates and separates us from the rest of the material universe. It’s an accident of history that Pascal’s collection of notes came to be called Pensées. But the title is appropriate, since the work as a whole could well be described as an extended meditation on human consciousness, on what it means to think.

iv. Critical Approaches and Interpretation

Criticism and interpretation of the Pensées have followed two main approaches. The first, which could be called the conventional or historical approach, is the one favored by most literary scholars and historians of religion, including most notably Philippe Sellier, David Wetsel, and Jean Mesnard. According to this view the Pensées are to be understood within the context and framework of traditional Christian apologetics. Moreover, the author’s original design and purpose (so far as modern scholarship can determine them) are to be carefully reconstructed and fully respected. Most of the biographers and critics who follow this approach agree that Pascal’s primary purpose was to articulate and defend Christianity – and especially the Augustinian-Jansenist form of Christianity practiced at Port-Royal – against its skeptical, atheistic, and deistic opponents.  In particular, they argued, Pascal aims to convert the contemporary free-thinker and honnête homme – that is to say, a figure much like his friends Mitton  and Méré and indeed not unlike a secular, rationalistic, and worldly version of himself. The work is thus understood to be not an inner drama enacting Pascal’s own personal struggles with religious belief but rather an artfully contrived dialog with and rhetorical proselytization of an imagined adversary. The “I” of the work, in this view, is not Pascal himself in propria persona but a polyphonic fiction – a range of literary voices and masks adopted by Pascal strictly as a rhetorical device and as a means of persuasion. Thus, any time we seem to hear the narrative voice of the Pensées expressing fear, doubt, conflict, or existential agony we are to understand that voice not as Pascal’s own, but as that of a literary creation or persona whose utterances are to be interpreted ironically or as presented for dramatic or rhetorical effect.

Although he was neither a literary scholar nor a historian of religion (but more like a cantankerous version of each), Voltaire seems to have read and understood the Pensées in this traditional way. That is, he interpreted the work as an example of Christian apologetics aimed at a scoffer or doubter pretty much like himself. Needless to say, he was not swayed by Pascal’s arguments. To the claim that the human condition is one of anxiety and wretchedness, he responds that we are neither as wicked nor as miserable as Pascal says. As for Pascal’s extensive discussion of miracles, prophecy, the figurative interpretation of Scripture, and the like, Voltaire regards the effort as so much wasted breath. He even suggests that Christianity would be better off without such strained and overwrought apologetics, which he compared to trying to prop up an oak tree by surrounding it with reeds.

The poet and critic T. S. Eliot, in his 1933 introductory essay to the Pensées, also interprets the work in this traditional way.  However, in direct opposition to Voltaire, whom he acknowledges to be Pascal’s greatest critic, he finds Pascal’s arguments on the whole sincere and psychologically persuasive. He departs from the traditional reading only to the extent that he considers the Pensées  not only as a work of Christian apologetics but also as an example of spiritual biography, an expression of Pascal’s forceful and idiosyncratic personality and unique combination of passion and intellect (360).

In opposition to this essentially historical and scholarly way of reading the Pensées, several critics and commentators, from Chateaubriand and Walter Pater to Paul Valéry, AJ Krailsheimer, and Lucien Goldmann, have offered versions of what might be called a “romantic,” “confessional,” or “phenomenological” approach. According to this line of interpretation, Pascal’s fragmentary narrative represents either a fictional portrait of a soul in crisis or a true personal confession in the manner of Augustine (and later Rousseau). That is, it presents a cri de coeur or cri de triomphe that provides a direct look into the heart and soul of a penitent former sinner who, after a long and agonizing struggle, finds Christ and renounces the world. Romantic readers themselves disagree on the extent to which this exercise in self-revelation is a conscious product – that is, a carefully arranged and skillfully made artifact – or, in a more psychoanalytic vein, the expression of the author’s actual inner conflicts and unconscious motives and intentions. They also offer different interpretations of the audience or addressee of the work. Are the Pensées a dramatic monologue? A private confession addressed to God? A dialog between Pascal and the reader? Between Pascal and himself?  Are they truly intended to convert a Méré or a Mitton, and are they addressed only to skeptics and those lacking faith?  Or are they meant also as a meditative exercise and inspiration for active Christians, a spiritual tool to help guide believers and strengthen their faith? Or perhaps Pascal, in the manner of St. Paul, is trying to be all things to all people and thus to a certain extent trying to do some or all of the above at the same time?

The great Victorian critic Walter Pater compares the Pensées to Shakespearian tragedy and notes that Pascal is not a converted skeptic or former infidel who has seen the light. Instead, he seems caught “at the very centre of a perpetually maintained tragic crisis holding the faith steadfastly, but amid the well-poised points of essential doubt all around him.” The Pensées, Pater goes on to claim, dramatize an intense inner dialectic: “no mere calm supersession of a state of doubt by a state of faith; the doubts never die, they are only just kept down in a perpetual agonia.”

This view of the Pensées as an interior dialogue or psychomachia dramatizing Pascal’s own personal struggle between faith and doubt is thoroughly rejected by Jean Mesnard and other scholars who insist that any hint of such a struggle is merely a rhetorical pose on Pascal’s part and employed for dramatic effect.

Pascal was proclaimed a heretic and a Calvinist during his lifetime and has been called everything from a skeptic to a nihilist by modern readers. So to a certain extent Paul Valéry in his controversial essay “Variations on a Pensée” was for the most part only repeating criticisms of the author  that earlier critics, many of them Catholic clergymen, had made before (for example, that he was a poor theologian, that he was insensitive to natural beauty and to art, and so forth). Valéry seems to recognize a distinction between Pascal the author and the “I” of the Pensées, but he finds the “I” of the work so artificial and overwrought that he accuses the author of being hypocritical and insincere. Thinking of the passage in the Pensées about the terror induced by “the eternal silence” of infinite space (201/233), he says, here is a “strange Christian,” who gazes upon the starry heavens yet fails to discover his Heavenly Father. Echoing a criticism formerly made by Voltaire, Valéry likens Pascal to a tragic poet who portrays the human condition as much bleaker and harsher than it actually is; who describes the fears and torments of life vividly, but who depicts its delights and joys, its moments of excitement and intensity, hardly at all.

Lucien Goldmann has argued that the fragmentary form of the Pensées may be an accident due to Pascal’s death, but it also qualifies as a brilliantly achieved creative product, an aesthetically and psychologically appropriate form that not only reflects the true style and state of mind of Pascal himself and of his narrative persona but also captures the mood and temper of his time. Writing from a Lukácsian-Marxist and evolutionary perspective that he calls “genetic structuralism,” Goldmann views Pascal as both a cutting-edge, creative force and at the same time a product of his personal circumstances and historical era. In this interpretation, Pascal sets up dialectical polarities in the Pensées –man’s wretchedness vs. his greatness; concupiscence vs. godliness and sacrifice; Old Testament type vs. New Testament antitype; reason vs. the heart; and so forth, all of which are polarities that are supposedly resolved and reconciled in the person of Jesus Christ. Those polarities are homologous with and paralleled by the larger historical oppositions of the period: the new science vs. ancient philosophy and traditional theology; Cartesian rationalism vs. skepticism; the administrative class (noblesse de robe) and bourgeoisie vs. the nobility; Protestantism and Jansenism vs. Catholicism; and so forth. Viewed in this way, the Pensées can be seen to encapsulate and effectively dramatize the main intellectual and social dynamics of an entire era.

v. The Wager

One of the more remarkable developments in Western philosophy is the fact that one sliver of the Pensées , a single fragment of a fragmentary text and but a small portion of the untidy, multi-part, unfinished work that contains it, has achieved a full literary life of its own, with its own lively history of commentary and criticism. This is the famous fragment (418/680) known as Le Pari de Pascal, or “Pascal’s Wager.”  Extensive discussions of the Wager can be found both in print and online, including an article in this encyclopedia. These discussions address a range of issues relating to the Wager, such as its status in the development of decision theory and probability theory, the various objections that have been made against it, and the numerous revised or alternate versions and applications that have been derived from it. This section will take up only two matters related to the topic: (1) the question of whether or not Pascal himself sincerely approved the Wager and believed that it presents a legitimate and persuasive argument for faith in God; (2) the response to the Wager on the part of a few selected philosophers and critics along with a glance at some of its precedents in literary history.

Simply characterized, the Wager is a second-person dialog in which Pascal imagines an individual forced to choose between belief in God and disbelief in Him. He analyzes the situation as if the reader-protagonist (the “you” of the imaginary dialog) were involved in a great existential coin-toss game.  The conditions and possible outcomes of the Wager are presented in the following table:

You bet that He exists You bet that He does not exist
God exists + ∞ (infinite gain) - ∞ (infinite loss)
God does not exist - x (finite loss) + x (finite gain)

Pascal argues that given the terms of the Wager it is not simply prudent, it is practically obligatory to bet on God’s existence and illogical and utterly foolish to bet against Him. For consider: if you bet on His existence, you stand to win an infinite reward (an eternity in paradise) at the risk of only a small loss (whatever earthly pleasures you would be required to forego during your mortal life). On the other hand, if you bet against His existence, you risk the possibility of an infinite loss (loss of paradise – along with the possibility of an eternity in Hell) for only a limited gain (the opportunity to enjoy a few years’ worth of worldly delights). 

Pascal was a lifelong Catholic whose personal conversion from lukewarm to whole-hearted faith was accomplished not by rational argument but by a life-changing mystical experience. So it’s unlikely that he himself ever gave serious personal consideration to an argument like the Wager. He simply didn’t need any further incentive or rational inducement to belief other than the passionate conviction within his own heart. On the other hand, it’s not unlikely that he thought the Wager might appeal to and perhaps even sway a libertine, a skeptic, or a Deist who might be teetering on the brink of belief. And that goes even more for a figure like a Méré or Mitton or any of the other young gallants and connoisseurs of honnêteté whom Pascal came to know in the salons and gaming rooms of Paris. After all, what better than a wager to entice a gambler? “Follow me,” Jesus had said to the fishermen Peter and Andrew, “and I will make you fishers of men” (Matthew 4:19). Similarly, Pascal, in the role a latter-day apostle, uses a game of chance as a net to bring sinners to salvation.

The concept of the Wager was by no means original with Pascal. Versions of it can be found as far back as Euripides’ The Bacchae. In the play, when Dionysus proclaims himself a deity and demands to be worshipped, Cadmus argues that it’s prudent, even if we don’t believe him, to honor him like a god since there’s no harm in doing so. (On the other hand, we risk a great deal of personal hardship by failing to show him proper reverence if he truly is a god.)

Sir Thomas More’s anecdote of the Gallant and the Friar presents in an inverted form a similar conflict and moral: When a gallant sees a friar walking barefoot in the snow, he asks him why he endures such pain. The friar responds that the pain is trivial, if we remember Hell. “But what if there is no hell?” inquires the amused gallant, adding “then art thou a great fool.” “Yes, master,” the friar replies, “but what if there is a hell? Then art thou a greater fool.”

A comical modern parody of the Wager occurs in the 1951 Broadway musical Guys and Dolls. Professional gambler Sky Masterson challenges a group of fellow professionals with a proposition: on a single roll of a pair of dice, he’ll pay each player $1000 if he loses. But if he wins, the gamblers will have to attend a midnight revival meeting at the Save-a-Soul mission. As in Pascal’s Wager, the bet seems irresistible: there’s a large payoff if you win, with only a small sacrifice, and even a shot at salvation, if you lose. Sky wins his wager. The gamblers are “saved.”

Voltaire called the Wager “indecent and childish” and thought it strange that Pascal reduced questions of the highest gravity to the mathematics of games of chance. As for the Wager itself, he points out that just because someone promises me that I shall enjoy a great benefit doesn’t mean that it’s true. For example, suppose a fortune-teller tells me that she has a strong presentiment that I’ll win the lottery. Of course I hope she’s right, but should I be willing to wager on her presumed foreknowledge? If so, how much? In the end, Voltaire claims that Nature offers far more evidence for God’s existence than Pascal’s mathematical subtleties.

Following up on Voltaire’s objections, Diderot pointed out that Pascal’s same basic argument (better to believe than not to believe) would apply equally well to any other religion: “An imam could argue just as well this way.” Indeed, by this logic, it could be argued that the more fanatical the religion, and the more extreme its promised rewards for belief and punishments for non-belief, the more powerful the argument in its favor.

Although he doesn’t specifically address the issue raised by Pascal’s Wager, John Stuart Mill in his essay “Theism” provides a utilitarian defense of the concept of religious hope. In effect, he argues that in a case where the truth is uncertain and the alternatives, immortality of the soul vs. extinction; existence of God vs. His non-existence, appear equally probable, it is legitimate to prefer the more hopeful option as being the choice more likely conducive to overall happiness.

In his essay “The Will to Believe” William James offers a sharp critical assessment of the Wager and finds Pascal’s basic argument to be weak, sophistic, and insincere:

. . . When religious faith expresses itself thus, in the language of the gaming-table, it is put to its last trumps. Surely Pascal's own personal belief in masses and holy water had far other springs; and this celebrated page of his is but an argument for others, a last desperate snatch at a weapon against the hardness of the unbelieving heart. We feel that a faith in masses and holy water adopted willfully after such a mechanical calculation would lack the inner soul of faith's reality; and if we were ourselves in the place of the Deity, we should probably take particular pleasure in cutting off believers of this pattern from their infinite reward (224).

However, having said this, James goes on to makes a pragmatic case for voluntary belief similar to Mill’s utilitarian defense of “hope” and to some extent comparable to Kierkegaard’s “leap of faith”. He argues that there are matters where the truth is in doubt and science is incapable of passing judgment as in the question of whether God exists. Where that choice is, in his terms, live (meaning that it seems of vital interest and value to us and engages us emotionally), momentous (meaning that it is non-trivial and has serious consequences), and forced (meaning that we must choose one way or the other and cannot simply sit the fence or stand aside), then it is lawful, indeed even necessary for us to weigh the risks and evidence and choose. In the end, James basically recasts Pascal’s Wager in a new form, re-focusing on its existential and psychological dimensions and dispensing with what he regards as its stagy and cheapening gambling metaphors.

c. Minor Works (Opuscules)

Besides his two major works (the Pensées and the Provinciales), Pascal also wrote several shorter works touching on a wide range of topics – from political legitimacy and social order to Stoicism and romantic love. A brief overview and précis of some of the better known and more important of these minor works follows.

i. Writings on Grace

Essentially an extensive commentary on human nature and the doctrine of divine grace, the Écrits represent Pascal’s most ambitious venture into the arena of Catholic theological debate. First published in 1779, the work was written at the same time as the provinciales and covers much of the same ground (proximate power, concupiscence, free will, and so forth), though in a more serious and less cavalier manner and in a more direct and methodical form.  Along with other deep matters, Pascal here explicates Augustine’s distinction between human nature in its unfallen state as pure, innocent, and naturally just, though capable of choice and error, and our postlapsarian condition, which is in thrall to concupiscence and naturally prone, indeed practically bound to do evil if it were not for God’s prevenient grace.  Adam was upright but free to fall; we children of Adam are weighed down by sin, and incapable of rising by our own effort. But, we are free to accept grace and can therefore be lifted up.

Pascal dissects the problem of free will in a similarly Augustinian fashion. Adam had free will in the sense that he could freely choose either good or evil, though he naturally inclined to the former. We, in our concupiscent state, are also free to choose. However, we are naturally inclined to prefer evil, which in our ignorant, fallen condition we commonly mistake for good. Pascal also points out that through the grace of Jesus Christ, a grace instilled by the Holy Spirit, we can achieve a redeemed will – a will sufficient to overcome concupiscence and capable of recognizing and choosing good.

Commentators on the Écrits have questioned whether its depiction of grace (which is presented as something largely mysterious yet vital for salvation) is consistent with the rational apologetic approach and systematic style of argument that Pascal sought to use in the Pensées.

ii. On the Geometric Spirit

Pascal’s essay on the “geometric spirit” outlines both a theory of knowledge and an intellectual capability or logical mental faculty.  He asserts that geometry and mathematics are the only areas of human inquiry that provide knowledge that is both certain and infallible. He then supports this claim with arguments and demonstrations. He goes on to describe a certain quality or faculty of mind that he calls l’esprit géométrique, which he defines as the ability to take known or perceived truths and to present them in such a way – with such precise steps, perfect elegance, and logical rigor – that their truth cannot help but be recognized and approved by others. Such an irrefutable and triumphant persuasiveness – the ability to vanquish all doubt and counter-argument – seems to have been Pascal’s goal in all his writings, whether on scientific subjects or in matters of theological dispute. In any case, the “geometric spirit” is both a prominent characteristic of Pascal’s own genius as well as an important epistemological idea (illustrating both the powers and limitations of the human mind) that he returns to repeatedly throughout his writings.

iii. Discourse on the Passions of Love

Pascal’s authorship of the “Discourse on the Passions of Love” has been disputed for the obvious reason that its subject (romantic love) and sentiments (that love exalts the soul, that those with the greatest souls make the truest lovers, that secret or undeclared love entails both exquisite joy and agonizing pain, and so forth) are highly uncharacteristic of the writer and would seem to be far outside his range of interest and expertise. Yet the style of the Discourse is distinctively Pascalian and some of the ideas contained in it (such as the distinction between the “geometric” mind and the spirit of “finesse”) are certifiably his own. Thus his authorship, while dubious, is at least possible, and so the question for his critics and biographers becomes: how to account for a work that seems so utterly contrary to Pascal’s own modest habits and reputation, so much more in the spirit of the salons of Paris rather than the cells of Port-Royal?

The most popular way of dealing with the Discourse has been simply to dismiss it as uncanonical and regard it as, at bottom, some kind of anonymously composed pastiche that incorporates bits and echoes of Pascal along with selections from other sources. Alternatively, it could be argued that the Discourse is written in the style and spirit of the Paris salons because Pascal himself intentionally wrote it in that vein, possibly as a kind of literary exercise or demonstration on his part for the amusement of his friends Méré and Mitton and their circle. (One can indeed easily imagine the pair challenging their shy friend to attempt such an exercise and then delighting in his successful performance.) So even though the Discourse may indeed be Pascal’s, its content and sentiments are for the most part artificial and insincere, many of the expressed opinions being mere restatements or variations of age-old commonplaces and platitudes about romantic love taken either from the précieuse poetry of his own era or from earlier literature.  (See, for example, the medieval Rules of Courtly Love of Andreas Capellanus, a compendium of witty, lofty, acerbic, or tongue-in-cheek observations about love very similar to Pascal’s.)

iv. Discourses on the Condition of the Great

Despite its minor status, the “Discourses on the Great” is nevertheless of interest since it is the only work of Pascal’s that attempts to formulate something like a social or political philosophy. The work (which is addressed to a young man of high degree) begins with a parable about a castaway on an island whom the inhabitants (owing to his close physical resemblance) mistake for their long-lost king. Such, Pascal argues, is the condition of those born to nobility or wealth within society: it is only by coincidence or lucky accident and by the power of custom and convention, not by nature, that they have their status. From this it follows that persons of rank are obligated to conduct themselves with due humility and must never allow themselves to treat those on society’s lower rungs with insolence or disrespect. Pascal concludes the Discourses by reminding his young learner of his true condition and enjoins him to rule and lead with beneficence.

Simply stated, the political philosophy expressed in the Discourses is noblesse oblige. Pascal acknowledges that the origins of human inequality are of two kinds, natural and institutional. The former arise from relative abilities or deficiencies of mind or body. For instance, A has better eyesight than B; X is taller and stronger than Y).Institutional inequalities, unless they are sanctioned by divine law, are entirely conventional and sometimes even arbitrary and can be rescinded or overturned. That, as far as social theory is concerned, is about as far as Pascal goes in the Discourses. Since his primary purpose is to offer moral instruction to a young nobleman, he doesn’t address topics like property, the social contract, divine right theory, which was a view recently and avidly affirmed by Louis XIV, or the ethics of revolt. From scattered comments in the Pensées, we know that he was politically conservative and despised violence. Apparently his experience during the Fronde led him to believe that even oppressive order is better than anarchy and that there is no worse social evil than civil war (see Pensées 94/128, 81/116, 85/119).

v. Prayer on the Proper Use of Sickness

Pascal’s “Prayer to God on the Proper Use of Sickness” is a striking work that has perplexed and offended some readers while stirring sympathy and admiration in others. Readers of the first sort, knowing of Pascal’s persistent illnesses and chronic pain, are disturbed to find him here not only begging forgiveness for the few pleasures he enjoyed during his brief intervals of health, but even thanking God for his lifetime of afflictions and earnestly beseeching Him for more of the same. These readers view the “Prayer” as an expression of almost pathological morbidity and the testament of a fanatic. Interpreted in this way, Pascal’s portrayal of the pleasures of life as cruel and deadly and of disease and affliction as salutary and healing seem not so much holy paradoxes as evidence of the extent to which the gloom of Jansenism had darkened his entire outlook.

This reading is defective in at least two ways. First, it ignores the fact that the paradoxes invoked in the “Prayer”—life is death; death is life; health is illness, illness is health; pain is pleasure, pleasure is pain; and so forth — are Christian commonplaces and that the rhetorical use of such figures had long been a standard feature of Christian discourse. (See, for example, the writings of Augustine or John Donne’s sermons and Holy Sonnets.) Second, any accusation of exaggerated melodrama or overstatement in the “Prayer” also overlooks the degree to which serious illness and devastating rates of mortality – plagues, deaths, executions, amputations – were an everyday part of life in Europe during the 17th century. Viewed in this context, the “Prayer” may still strike modern readers as unnaturally bleak, but it expresses sentiments and feelings that many of Pascal’s contemporaries would have been familiar with and shared.

The “Prayer” can be more accurately characterized as a simple statement of faith and humility and a plea for patience and courage. It expresses the blend of neo-stoicism and contemptus mundi that was common in prayers and sermons of the day. Christian stoicism had been recently introduced into French literature via the writings of Guillaume du Vair, and Pascal had likely read Epictetus’s Enchiridion in du Vair’s translation. Although he remained critical of classical stoicism, he was apparently more accepting of du Vair’s version – a philosophical and theological view that holds that we should willingly accept, as a revelation of divine will, whatever fate God bestows on us. Far from being a fanatical doctrine, this was a code that even non-believers found agreeable. Indeed most of us find it admirable when individuals who are sorely afflicted with a disease or who have suffered the loss of an organ or limb accept their condition with fortitude and equanimity.

vi. Pascal’s Conversation with M. de Saci on Epictetus and Montaigne

The minor work Entretien avec Saci is not actually Pascal’s, but was composed by Nicolas Fontaine, a member of the Port-Royal community. It is the record of a conversation that took place between Pascal and his spiritual director Lemaistre de Sacy shortly after Pascal took up residence at Port-Royal in 1654. The work wasn’t published until 1736, but it’s an important document nevertheless since it represents the fullest discussion that we have of Pascal’s views on Western philosophy. The portrait of Pascal that emerges from the Conversation is well drawn and seems authentic, and the words and style are recognizably his own. Many of the ideas presented in the work can be found scattered throughout the Pensées, where they are expressed in nearly similar language and where once again Epictetus and Montaigne stand as mighty opposites: the former championing but over-estimating the greatness and nobility of humankind, the latter recognizing but exaggerating our folly and ignorance.

Pascal praises Epictetus as a brilliant philosopher whose knowledge of our essential moral duties and especially of our need for patience, courage, faith, and humility is unsurpassed. Unfortunately, the philosopher’s “diabolic pride” leads him astray. For example, Epictetus wrongly supposes that human reason is a perfectly reliable guide to truth. He also errs in holding that the mind and the senses are sufficient for perceiving and understanding the true nature and overall justice of the cosmos.

Of Montaigne, Pascal remarks that although he was a professed Catholic he nevertheless chose to forego Christian doctrine as a source of moral law and turned instead to his, admittedly fallible, personal judgment and natural instinct as ethical guides. Pascal then goes on to criticize Montaigne for his utter and thoroughgoing Pyrrhonism symbolized by the device of a scales that Montaigne had emblazoned on the ceiling of his study with his famous motto Que sais-je?(What do I know?) inscribed beneath. Pascal argues that, in contrast to Epictetus, Montaigne’s error consists not in glorifying or over-estimating human reason and knowledge but rather in denying them any credit or status whatsoever. Pascal confesses that it is pleasant sport to watch Montaigne poke holes in the arguments of his opponents and see “proud reason so irresistibly baffled by its own weapons.” Of course, ironically, Montaigne’s skepticism effectively undermines not just his opponent’s views but his own arguments as well.

Near the end of the conversation, Pascal launches into an oratorical peroration describing how the errors, imperfections, and opposing polarities represented by the two philosophers are ultimately mediated and reconciled in the person of Jesus Christ. @

It is therefore from this imperfect enlightenment that it happens that the one [that is, Epictetus] knowing the duties of man and being ignorant of his impotence, is lost in presumption, and that the other [that is, Montaigne], knowing the impotence and being ignorant of the duty, falls into laxity; whence it seems that since the one leads to truth, the other to error, there would be formed from their alliance a perfect system of morals. But instead of this peace, nothing but war and a general ruin would result from their union; for the one establishing certainty, the other doubt, the one the greatness of man, the other his weakness, they would destroy the truths as well as the falsehoods of each other. So that they cannot subsist alone because of their defects, nor unite because of their opposition, and thus they break and destroy each other to give place to the truth of the Gospel. This it is that harmonizes the contrarieties by a wholly divine act, and uniting all that is true and expelling all that is false, thus makes of them a truly celestial wisdom in which those opposites accord that were incompatible in human doctrines. . . . Such is the marvelous and novel union which God alone could teach, and which He alone could make, and which is only a type and an effect of the ineffable union of two natures in the single person of a Man-God.

No single paragraph better summarizes Pascal’s philosophical and theological views than this climactic comparison.

3. Mathematical and Scientific Works

a. Conic Sections

Pascal made his first important mathematical discovery and published his first article, the Essay on Conics (1640), at the age of sixteen. Barely an essay at all, the work is a one-page document consisting of three diagrams, three definitions, and two lemmas. Although it had little immediate impact beyond a small circle of mathematicians, it was nevertheless a breakthrough contribution to the emerging new field of projective geometry. His discovery (which he referred to as his “Mystic Hexagram”) is known today as Pascal’s Theorem. It states that if six points are situated on a conic section (an ellipse, parabola, or hyperbola), and if these points are then joined by line segments to form a hexagon, then if the sides of this hexagon are projected beyond the section, the pairs of opposite sides will meet in three points all of which lie on a straight line.

Fig. 1

Figure 1: Pascal's "Mystic Hexagram." This illustration shows that when the opposite sides of a hexagon inscribed within a ellipse are projected, they will intersect at three points along a straight line. (In this case all the points lie entirely outside the ellipse.)

After his death, Pascal’s unpublished mathematical papers (including what seems to have been a full treatise on conics) were collected by his nephew Étienne Périer. Eventually these manuscripts were turned over to the great German philosopher and mathematician Gottfried Leibniz for his evaluation and use. Leibniz left behind an extensive set of notes on the collection and registered his admiration for Pascal’s genius. Unfortunately Pascal’s original papers have all been lost.

b. Experiments on the Vacuum

In 1644 the Italian physicist Evangelista Torricelli, testing a hypothesis suggested by Galileo, took a glass tube closed at one end and filled it with mercury. He then inverted the tube, open end down, into a bowl also containing mercury and watched as the mercury in the tube dropped slightly leaving a vacant space at the top. Contrary to the prevailing scientific view upheld by Aristotelians and Cartesians alike according to which a vacuum in nature is a physical impossibility, Torricelli surmised that the space at the top of the tube was indeed a vacuum and that it was created by the pressure of the external air, which exactly balanced the pressure exerted by the column of mercury inside the tube.

Pascal learned of the experiment from his former mentor Père Mersenne. Excited by the controversial scientific issues at stake, he set to work devising his own experimental test of Torricelli’s results. Just obtaining the required apparatus posed a huge challenge. Scientists of the era typically had to design, specify, oversee the production of, test, and of course pay for their own equipment. Pascal did all that and then went to work conducting his own experiments and demonstrations. Confident of his results, he went on tour to demonstrate his hypothesis, which he was able to do using tubes of different length and diameter and a variety of liquids. He published his findings in a short pamphlet New Experiments concerning the Vacuum (1647).

The decisive experiment, proving that the level of mercury in the tube was due to external air pressure, was conducted at the Puy-de-Dôme, the mountainous lava dome near Pascal’s native Clermont. Pascal designed and organized the experiment, but because of his health issues it was actually conducted by his brother-in-law Florin Périer along with a team of observers, clerics, and local officials. Using two identical tubes, the team measured the levels of mercury at a base point in the town. Then, with a portion of the party staying behind to monitor the mercury level in one tube, which remained at the home base, Florin and the rest of the party ascended the mountain with the other tube and measured the mercury level at various elevations. It was found that the level of mercury in the mobile (or test) tube varied inversely with the altitude. Meanwhile, the mercury level in the stationary (or control) tube never varied. Repeated experiments produced the same conclusive results: the level of mercury was due to air pressure, which also has the ability to create a vacuum.

Pascal published a record of the experiment in a short document entitled “The Account of the Great Experiment of the Equilibrium of Fluids.” to which he appended a closing note that deserves quotation since it marks a historic turning point in the advance of modern science vis-à-vis ancient authority. On the basis of his experiments, he asserts “that nature has no repugnance for the vacuum” and “makes no effort to avoid it”:

. . . all the effects that have been attributed to her horror have their origin in the weight and pressure of the air, that it is their sole and true cause. . . . It is not on this occasion only that, when the weakness of men has been unable to find the true causes, their subtlety has substituted imaginary causes to which they have given specious names filling the ears and not the mind. Thus it is said that the sympathy and antipathy of natural bodies are efficient causes, responsible for many effects, as if inanimate bodies were capable of sympathy and antipathy; it is the same with antiperistasis and with many other chimerical causes, which but give a vain solace to man’s hunger to know hidden truths, and which, far from revealing them, serve only to cover up the ignorance of such inventors and to feed that of their followers.

One other document relating to the vacuum that dates from this period (October 29, 1647) and which bears special mention is Pascal’s reply to (the felicitously if improbably named) Père Noël. A Jesuit priest who embraced the widely accepted doctrine (approved by both Aristotelian and Cartesian physicists) that nature is a material plenum and will not permit a vacuum, Noël had written a letter to Pascal defending the horror vacui viewpoint and arguing that the empty space that Pascal claims to have observed at the top of the tubes in his experiments was not empty space at all but a space necessarily filled with “rarified air” or some other subtle form of substance. Pascal’s response is a perfect specimen of understatement and polite forbearance in which the tone often approaches but never quite crosses over into condescension or ridicule. The provinciales are usually cited as the original instance of classic French prose style, but the letter to Noël and indeed a number of Pascal’s scientific papers – all notable for their force, clarity, concision, and elegance as well as for their utter absence of bombast, fustian, and needless adornment – could also lay claim to setting the model. An early paragraph in Pascal’s letter succinctly defines his criteria and standards of truth in matters of scientific investigation; two later paragraphs illustrate his tactful but forceful way of dealing with the kind of learned ignorance that Sir Francis Bacon had referred to as “vain imaginations” and the “idols of the theatre”:

The rule [of scientific method] is never to make a decisive judgment, affirming or denying a proposition, unless what one affirms or denies satisfies one of the two following conditions: either that of itself it appear so clearly and distinctly to sense or to reason, according as it is subject to one or the other, that the mind cannot doubt its certainty, and this is what we call a principle or axiom, as, for example, if equals are added to equals, the results are equal; or that it be deduced as an infallible and necessary consequence from such principles or axioms . . . . Everything satisfying one of these conditions is certain and true, and everything satisfying neither is considered doubtful and uncertain.  We pass decisive judgment on things of the first kind and leave the rest undecided, calling them, according to their deserts, now a vision, now a caprice, occasionally a fancy, sometimes an idea, and at the most a happy thought; and since it is rash to affirm them, we incline rather to the negative, ready however to return to the affirmative if a convincing demonstration brings their truth to light….

For all things of this kind [that is, hypothetical entities] whose existence is not manifest to sense are as hard to believe as they are easy to invent. Many persons, even among the most learned men of the day, have opposed me with this same substance [that is, rarified air or some comparable ethereal matter] before you (but simply as an idea and not as a certain truth), and that is why I mentioned it among my propositions. Others, to fill empty space with some kind of matter, have imagined one with which they have filled the entire universe, because imagination has this peculiarity that it produces the greatest things with as little time and trouble as little things; some have considered this matter as of the same substance as the sky and the elements, and others of a different substance, as their fancy dictated, for they disposed of it as of their own work.

But if we ask of them, as of you, that you show us this matter, they answer that it cannot be seen; if we ask that it make a sound, they say it cannot be heard, and so with all the remaining senses; and they think they have done much when they have convicted others of powerlessness to show that it does not exist by depriving themselves of all power to show that it does.

Pascal later composed, but never published, two detailed monographs that were discovered among his manuscripts after his death: a Treatise on the Equilibrium of Liquids and a Treatise on the Weight of the Mass of Air. These two treatises represent seminal contributions to the sciences of hydraulics and hydrostatics and include the discovery that if no other forces are acting on a fluid, the pressure will be the same throughout the fluid and the same in all directions – an observation that is known today as Pascal’s Principle. It is in recognition of his important work in the study of fluid mechanics that a standard unit of pressure is today known as the pascal (Pa), defined as a force equal to 1 Newton per square meter.

c. Pascal’s Triangle and Probability Theory

In 1654, Pascal responded to a series of problems posed by his friend Antoine Gombaud, the self-styled Chevalier de Méré, an amateur mathematician and noted gambler. Suppose, Pascal was asked, that you are given 24 rolls of a pair of dice. What is the probability of your throwing double sixes at least one time? Méré also asked a related question known as the “problem of the points” (also known as the problem of the division of the stakes). This problem asks, if a wager game is terminated before it has been completed, how should the contestants divide the stakes? For example, suppose that A and B are playing a winner-take-all game in which a point is scored on every try and the winner is the first player to reach ten points. How should the stakes be divided if the game is terminated after A has 7 points and B has 5?

Pascal developed solutions to these and other problems relating to the calculation of gambling odds and in an exchange of letters shared his insights with the great Toulouse mathematician Pierre de Fermat. Together the two correspondents effectively founded the modern theory of probability.

Part of the foundation for the modern theory is provided in Pascal’s “Treatise on the Arithmetical Triangle,” which he composed in 1653. (He sent a copy of this document to Fermat during their correspondence, but it was never published until after his death.) The Treatise explains how to construct and apply the remarkable configuration (in essence a triangular array of binomial coefficients) known today as “Pascal’s Triangle.” The array had been generated and used previously by Chinese, Indian, Persian, and European mathematicians, and Pascal never claimed to have discovered or originated it. He was simply interested in demonstrating its fascinating properties and powers.

Pascal triangle Figure 2. Pascal's Triangle.

Pascal calls the square containing each number in the array a cell. The numeral 1’s at the top of his triangle head perpendicular rows; those on the left side of the triangle head parallel rows. He calls the third (diagonal) side of the triangle the base. Cells along any diagonal row are called cells of the same base. The first diagonal row (consisting of the number 1) is row 0. The second diagonal row (1, 1) is row 1; and so on. The number value of each cell is equal to the sum of its immediately preceding perpendicular and parallel cells. For example, 120 in the base diagonal (item 4 in row 7) = 36 + 84.

Furthermore, the number value of each cell is also equal to the sum of all the cells of the preceding row (from the first cell to the cell immediately above the target cell). For example, 126 (the number value of cell 6 in row 5) = 1 + 4 + 10 + 20 + 35 + 56 (the sum of cells 1-6 of row 4).

Pascal explains in detail how the Triangle can be used to calculate combinations (that is to compute C in cases where nCr = n things taken r at a time). As Pascal demonstrates, to find the answer we would move perpendicularly down to the nth row and then move diagonally r cells. For example, for 5C4, we would go perpendicularly down to row 5 and then move diagonally 4 cells and find that the number of combinations is 5. Similarly, if we calculate for 6C3,we would move down 6 rows and then diagonally 3 cells and find that the answer is 20. And so on. In another section of the Treatise, Pascal explains how to use the Triangle to solve the Problem of Points.

Solutions to Méré’s problems:

1. Probability of at least one double-six in 24 rolls of two dice: 1 - (35/36)24 = 0.4914.

2. Problem of points: A needs 3 more points, B needs 5 more points. (Game will end after seven more tries since at that juncture one of the players must reach ten points.) Count 3 + 5 rows on the Triangle; then sum the first 5 items. That sum divided by the sum of all items in the row is A’s portion of the stakes. Then sum the remaining 3 items in the row and divide that total by the sum of all the items in the row. That will be B’s portion.

From the Triangle:

(1+7+21+35+35) ÷ (1+7+21+35+35+21+7+1) = 99/128 = A’s portion.

(1+7+21) ÷ (1+7+21+35+35+21+7+1) = 29/128 = B’s portion.

Expressed as a percentage, A receives 77.34375 percent of the stake; B receives 22.65625 percent of the stake.

d. Infinity

The idea of mathematical infinity – of a number that can be vaguely conceived but whose properties and nature can never be fully understood – has strong affinities with Pascal’s idea of God and also relates to his Wager and to his personal anxiety as he contemplates the “eternal silence of these infinite spaces” (201/233).

Imagine Pascal’s Triangle. Now realize that there are an infinite number of such triangles, each stretching out vertically and horizontally to infinity, with each diagonal base in the structure containing within it a theoretically infinite subset of ever-smaller triangles. Such is the paradoxical notion of infinity, a concept that astounded and haunted Pascal, and which has teased, baffled, and intrigued a long list of theorists and commentators from Nicholas of Cusa and Giordano Bruno to Bertrand Russell and David Foster Wallace. Although the idea of infinity can fill the imagination with dread, it can also, as Pascal points out at the conclusion of his treatise Of the Geometrical Spirit, provide us with a true understanding of nature and of our place in it:

But those who clearly perceive these truths will be able to admire the grandeur and power of nature in this double infinity that surrounds us on all sides, and to learn by this marvelous consideration to know themselves, in regarding themselves thus placed between an infinitude and a negation of extension, between an infinitude and a negation of number, between an infinitude and a negation of movement, between an infinitude and a negation of time. From which we may learn to estimate ourselves at our true value, and to form reflections which will be worth more than all the rest of geometry itself.

e. Solving the Cycloid

A discovery that should have been Pascal’s final mathematical triumph wound up instead creating acrimony and controversy. In the spring of 1658, supposedly as a diversion while contending with a toothache, he took up the problem of the roulette or cycloid, a problem that had puzzled some of Europe’s best mathematicians, including Galileo and Descartes, for nearly a century.

Pascal Fig. 3

Figure 3: Cycloid

Imagine a point P on the circumference of a revolving circle. A cycloid is the curve described by P as it rolls along a straight line.  The challenge is to discover and prove the area of this curve geometrically. Pascal worked out his own solution and then, as was common practice at the time, issued a public challenge to fellow mathematicians. Under the name Amos Dettonville, an anagram of the pseudonym Louis de Montalte, which he had used to write the provinciales (an anagram of the motto Talentum Deo Soli – “My talent for God alone”—according to Morris Bishop), Pascal drew up a list of six problems relating to the cycloid and offered a prize of 600 livres to the first person to solve them (Bishop 222). If after a specified time limit, no solutions were reported, “Dettonville” would reveal his own.

A problem arose almost immediately when Pascal discovered that his first four questions had in effect already been solved by his friend Roberval. The contest was therefore reduced to the final two questions, a change that, unfortunately, was not made clear to all the contestants. In addition, some contestants protested that the time limit was unreasonably short. Christian Huygens and Christopher Wren published solutions, but did not compete for the prize. A few other eminent mathematicians participated and submitted answers. However, Pascal, finding none of the submissions fully satisfactory, eventually revealed his own solutions and declared himself the winner. Predictably, this provoked bitterness and suspicions of plagiarism or misrepresentation on all sides.

Though the controversy left a blemish on Pascal’s reputation, his work on the cycloid has been admired by later mathematicians for its ingenuity and elegance, and he is credited, alongside his great contemporaries Galileo, Torricelli, Descartes, Mersenne, Roberval, Fermat, Wren, and Huygens, as having helped to solve the curve once known for its power to attract and captivate all who studied it as the “Helen of geometers.” In 1672, after having obtained and reviewed copies of Pascal’s papers on conics and the cycloid, Leibniz attested to their brilliance and concluded that were it not for an “evil fate” (by which phrase it’s unclear whether he meant their author’s short lifespan or his absorption in Jansenist theology) Pascal would have almost certainly gone on to make further and deeper mathematical discoveries.

Summarizing Pascal’s scientific and mathematical achievements, it can be said that in an age of amateurism, when everyone from priests and attorneys to soldiers and salonnières dabbled in “natural philosophy,” he was a marvel who often found himself in a position analogous to that later experienced by Newton and Leibniz: that is, he had to communicate dramatically new, highly complex and abstract concepts to readers who lacked his extraordinary mathematical imagination and facility. Having made his discoveries more or less instinctively, using his own private mathematical inventions and methods, he then found he had to “translate” his ideas into the conventionally accepted language and procedures of his peers and fellow numerophiles. Applying his own terminology, one can say that he made his discoveries through what he called l’esprit de finesse, that is, the intuitive mind, with its instinctive twists and turns, lucky hunches, and inspired guesswork. He found, however, that in order to communicate his findings to others he had to turn to what he styled l’esprit géométrique that is, the geometric mind, which he defined as the skill or capacity for “demonstrating truths already found, and of elucidating them in such a manner that the proof of them shall be irresistible”. Excellence in science and mathematics, he argued, requires both capabilities. It was Pascal’s good fortune to possess both l’esprit de finesse and l’esprit géométrique in rare and powerful abundance.

4. Philosophy of Science and Theory of Knowledge

a. Philosophy of Science

Of the many great natural philosophers of the 17th century  – a group that includes both theoreticians and experimentalists and such illustrious names as Galileo, Descartes, Bacon, Boyle, Huygens, and Gassendi – Pascal arguably was the one who came closest to articulating a coherent, comprehensive, durable philosophy of science consistent with and comparable to the standard view that prevails today, except that he came up short. As Desmond M. Clarke has argued, Pascal was torn between his love of geometric proof and pure logical demonstration on the one hand and his skeptical, pragmatic instincts in favor of down-to-earth experimentalism and empiricism on the other. As a result he seemed trapped in a kind of philosophical limbo. (See “Pascal’s Philosophy of Science,” in Hammond, 118.) Similarly, although he seemed to recognize that our knowledge of the natural world is only probable and can never be certain, a part of him nevertheless remained enthralled by the “will-o-the-wisp” or “Holy Grail” of absolute certainty.

In most other respects, Pascal’s outlook is ahead of its time and admirable in its self-restraint and in its awareness of its own limitations. Unlike Bacon, he makes room for hypothesis and even imaginative insight and conjecture (l’esprit de finesse) and also allows a deductive component a la Descartes (l’esprit géométrique). He acknowledges that all hypotheses must be tested and confirmed by rigorous experiments, and even if he didn’t actually carry out his experiments exactly as described, he nevertheless accepts the necessity of such testing. Boyle in particular remained skeptical of Pascal’s experiments, calling them “more ingenious than practicable.” He especially marveled at the availability of 40-ft. Torricelli tubes and of brass fittings engineered to nearly microscopic precision. Attempting to reproduce one of Pascal’s hydrostatic tests involving a fly in a chamber of water, Boyle attests that “upon tryal with a strong flie” the creature “presently drowned” (243.)

Pascal fully understood that once a hypothesis is tested and confirmed, the problem of determining the true cause of the phenomenon still remains and becomes itself a matter for further conjecture. For example, take his prediction, experimentally confirmed, that the level of mercury in a Torricelli tube will decline as altitude increases. Pascal claimed that this phenomenon was due to the weight of air, though he knew that other factors might also explain the same effect. Indeed, for all he knew, an invisible emanation from the god Mercury may have influenced his results. (Ironically, the famous Puy-de-Dôme experiment had been performed near an ancient temple to that deity). As Pascal observed to Father Noël, fanciful explanations for phenomena are as easy to imagine as they are impossible to disprove.

In his correspondence with Noël, Pascal at one point suggests that it is fatal for one’s hypothesis if an experimental test fails to confirm a predicted outcome. However, as he himself and his fellow experimentalists certainly knew, there can be nearly as many reasons why an expected result does not occur, such as defective apparatus, lack of proper controls, measurement errors, extraordinary test circumstances, etc, as there are explanations for a result that occurs as expected. Apparently in his haste to champion the new science of experimentalism against its critics, both Cartesian and Scholastic, Pascal wanted to at least be able to say that if experiments cannot conclusively prove a given hypothesis, then they may at least be able to disprove it. If this was his intention, he was anticipating by nearly three centuries Karl Popper’s theory of empirical falsification and opposed to (and seemingly fearful at the prospect of) any view similar to WVO Quine’s theory of confirmation holism, according to which all scientific claims are at best only probable and there is no such thing as a decisive experiment.

b. Theory of Knowledge

Que-sais-je? (“What do I know?”) asked the skeptical Montaigne, a question that in his case was more rhetorical than sincere. Que puis-je savoir? (“What can I know?”) was Pascal’s more earnest if also slightly skeptical variation. Anticipating Kant, he wondered with what limitations and with what level of assurance we can confidently say we know what we believe we know.

Pascal has been plausibly labeled an empiricist, a foundationalist, even a positivist and a skeptic. The confusion is understandable and is due largely to the fact that his epistemological views are complex and seem in certain respects equivocal or inconsistent. For example, he accepts the rule of authority in some areas of knowledge, such as ancient history, while opposing and even forbidding it in others, especially physical science. He also recognizes three different types or sources of knowledge related to his so-called “three orders”: body/sense; mind/reason; heart/will or instinct, each with its own domain or area of applicability, level of certainty, and tests of confirmation and reliability.

i. Reason and Sense

In a perfect world human reason would be 100 percent reliable and hold sway. Presumably, Adam, prior to the Fall, had such a pristine and certain view of things, such that there was a perfect congruency or correspondence between his inner perceptions and the outer world. Pascal believes that the axioms and first principles of math, geometry, and logic constitute knowledge of this kind. They are perceived directly by reason and (along with any consequences that we can directly deduce from them) represent the only knowledge that we can know infallibly and with certainty. It is with respect to such axioms and principles alone that Pascal accepts Descartes’ criteria of clearness and distinctness as reliable evidence of truth. Everything else is subject to error and doubt.

A critic of Cartesian rationalism and the deductive method, which he referred to as “useless and uncertain” – 887/445, Pascal was for the most part an empiricist and experimentalist who held that our knowledge of the natural world is acquired through the senses and must be tested and empirically verified by experiment. Reason also has a role in this process. It guides our observations and assists us in the forming of hypotheses and predictions. It is reason that also judges and approves (or disapproves) the final results, though it does so on the basis of empirical evidence, not deductive logic or some preconceived system.

In the Preface to his Treatise on the Vacuum, Pascal declares that reason and sense alone must rule and authority has no place in the establishment of scientific truth. Authority is to be respected, he says, in history, jurisprudence, languages, and above all in matters of theology, where the authority of Scripture and the Fathers is omnipotent. But, he argues that in the case of physical science reverence for the ancients can actually cloud the truth and impede the advancement of knowledge, especially when such reverence is, blind, misplaced, or overly devout. He concludes the Preface with a witty reversal of roles in the heated, ongoing debate between “ancients and moderns”:

Those whom we call ancient were really new in all things, and properly constituted the infancy of mankind; and as we have joined to their knowledge the experience of the centuries which have followed them, it is in ourselves that we should find this antiquity that we revere in others.

ii. The Heart

If there is an element of mystery in Pascal’s theory of knowledge, it is in the source of knowledge and inner being that he terms le Coeur. In scattered places throughout the Pensées he makes reference to a logique du coeur or an ordre du coeur. But what exactly he means by such phrases he never clearly explains. The term coeur appears most famously in fragment 423/680:

The heart has its reasons, which reason does not know. We feel it in a thousand things. I say that the heart naturally loves the Universal Being, and also itself naturally, according as it gives itself to them; and it hardens itself against one or the other at its will. You have rejected the one, and kept the other. Is it by reason that you love yourself?

“The heart has its reasons, which reason doesn’t know.” Not only has Pascal’s famous aphorism become an oft-quoted cliché, it has also managed to enter and even permeate popular culture in the form of song lyrics, as the title of a love memoir, and as a message of endearment or benediction on bumper stickers and greeting cards. Even people who have never read a page of the Pensées are familiar with the quote, and while it seems safe to say that Pascal had no such sentimental meaning in mind, amour, in its various senses from romantic love and self-love to charity and maternal instinct, seems an inescapable association when we hear the phrase “reasons of the heart.” In fact, the Catholic scholar Romano Guardini has plausibly offered “love” and “charity” as appropriate translations or synonyms for coeur (133).

It has also been suggested that by “heart” Pascal means something transcending reason and prior to it (Peters 168-171; Kearns 101-02), almost as if it were some kind of Kantian intuition, or as if it were a form of natural or divinely endowed intelligence on the very cutting edge of perception; some instinctive faculty that, without contradicting reason, can either surpass it or supplement it. (110/142). Such a faculty, if it is indeed instinctive, would presumably be inborn and thus either a part of our basic nature and something that all humans share or a special gift or grace bestowed by God to the elect. And if it is intuitive, then it possibly bears some relation to what Pascal elsewhere terms l’esprit de finesse, the subtle or intuitive component of intellect that somehow “sees” or penetrates directly into truths that l’esprit géométrique,  the logical or sequential intelligence, can arrive at only via incremental, deductive steps. Heart-knowledge would then be like some faint glimmer or trace of the instantaneous, clairvoyant understanding that the unfallen Adam was believed to enjoy in Paradise. In any case, the notion of a raison du Coeur remains a critical crux in Pascal studies and posed a mystery and challenge to his readers.

5. Fideism

Fideism can be defined as the view that religious truth is ascertainable by faith alone and that faith is separate from, superior to, and generally antagonistic towards reason. Whenever the term shows up in a religious or philosophical discussion, it is typically in conjunction with a list that includes names like Tertullian, Luther, Montaigne, Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein, and William James. Pascal’s name is often inserted into this group.

Based on the foregoing definition of fideism, Pascal does not fit into such a list, though the tendency to include him is understandable. Perhaps the most compelling evidence in favor of labeling him a fideist is the striking fact of his midnight conversion and “Night of Fire,” the powerful, visionary experience, clearly more mystical than rational, on the basis of which he wound up explicitly rejecting “the god of the philosophers.” However, just because the medium or process through which a belief is achieved may not be rational, doesn’t mean that the belief itself  is unreasonable. For Pascal, that belief was his acceptance of Jesus Christ as his Lord and Savior. Kekule discovered the shape and structure of the benzene molecule in a dream. Though his means of discovery was non-rational, what he discovered was quite reasonable and proved true.

Another reason why Pascal’s religious views are sometimes confused with fideism is his notion of an infinite and hidden God, who is essentially beyond our comprehension and understanding and whose existence and nature transcends the limited perspectives of reason and sense perception. However, once again, just because God surpasses or eludes empirical sense and reason doesn’t mean that He is contrary to or incompatible with them. “Faith,” Pascal writes, “indeed tells what the senses do not tell, but not the contrary of what they see. It is above them, and not contrary to them” (185/265). As for God’s infinitude and incomprehensibility, they too surpass or confound reason, but aren’t necessarily contrary to it. The notion of mathematical infinity baffles us in the same way. As Pascal points out, just because something is incomprehensible, for example, God, infinity, “a sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere,” doesn’t mean that it can’t exist (149,230/182,262).

Some critics have even used the Wager itself (418/680) as a basis for linking Pascal to fideism since that fragment sets forth and vividly illustrates the view that God’s existence is uncertain and can’t be proved. Of particular significance in this respect is the paragraph in which Pascal, in an observation that seems to echo Tertullian almost as much as St. Paul, candidly acknowledges the “foolishness” of the Christian creed:

Who then will blame Christians for not being able to give reasons for their beliefs, since they profess belief in a religion which they cannot explain? They declare, when they expound it to the world, that it is foolishness, stultitiam; and then you complain because they do not prove it! If they proved it, they would not keep their word; it is through their lack of proofs that they show they are not lacking in sense.

But, again, not being able to prove or give a convincing explanation for a belief is not quite the same thing as saying that the belief is incompatible with or contrary to reason. Conspiracy theories are typically lamely supported and impossible to prove, but they are seldom implausible or illogical. Moreover, it is not just a fideistic claim, but a perfectly orthodox Catholic view (and indeed a widely observable fact) that reason has limits; that it is indeed, as Pascal claims, unreasonable to trust reason too much. “Reason's last step is the recognition that there are an infinite number of things which are beyond it.”  (188/220.)

Pascal eschewed metaphysical proofs of God’s existence not on fideistic grounds because he thought that, as rational constructions, they were contrary to faith, but because he felt they were emotionally sterile and too abstruse and technical to persuade a non-believer:

The metaphysical proofs for the existence of God are so remote from human reasoning and so involved that they make little impact, and, even if they did help some people, it would only be for the moment during which they watched the demonstration, because an hour later they would be afraid they had made a mistake. (190/222)

And this is why I shall not undertake here to prove by reasons from nature either the existence of God, or the Trinity or the immortality of the soul, or anything of that kind: not just because I should not feel competent to find in nature arguments which would convince hardened atheists, but also because such knowledge, without Christ, is useless and sterile. Even if someone were convinced that the proportions between numbers are immaterial, eternal truths, depending on a first truth in which they subsist, called God, I should not consider that he made much progress towards his salvation. The Christian's God does not consist merely of a God who is the author of mathematical truths and the order of the elements. That is the portion of the heathen and Epicureans. (449/690)

In the end, the strongest reason for denying Pascal a place within fideism is that he believed that even the most “irrational” proofs of Christianity – the prophesies, miracles, typological confirmations, and so forth – were not only not contrary to reason but were in fact perfectly compatible with it. (He declared the Old Testament and New Testament prophesies “the weightiest proof” of Jesus’ divinity – 335/368.) That Christianity is reasonable though not provable by reason effectively summarizes one of the central arguments of the entire Pensées.

6. Existentialism

Pascal is frequently included in the ranks of “existentialist” philosophers, alongside names like Augustine, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Sartre.

Again it can be asked (as it was in the case of his alleged affiliation with fideism) whether he belongs in such a list . Once again, the strict, technical response would seem to be that he isn’t an existentialist–although in this case the label is arguably more appropriate and may even be justified.

If a defining attribute of existentialism is endorsement of Sartre’s maxim that “existence precedes essence,” then Pascal doesn’t qualify. For in his view human beings enter the world with a largely defined and determined nature and a destiny that is partly charted, partly free. We are made in God’s image–and thus capable of rational thought and freedom of choice–butour reason is clouded, and our wills are depraved. We are broken creatures and would be hopelessly lost if it were not for divine grace. If such a view of the human condition is incompatible with existentialism, then Pascal is no existentialist.

On the other hand, if Augustine and Kierkegaard (or for that matter any Christian thinker) can be considered existentialists in some broad sense, then it is hard to see why Pascal might not also qualify.  Like Augustine and Kierkegaard, he emphasizes the priority of the individual and the deeply personal character of our choice to believe. Like them, he values and personally exemplifies an extreme inwardness, indeed at times displays an almost fanatical absorption in his mental and spiritual life. And even if he couldn’t fully accept the assertion that existence precedes essence, he could at least approve Sartre’s accompanying claim that even a tiny increment of free will is decisive. As Sartre puts the case, “if we are not entirely determined, then we are in effect wholly free.” Pascal would agree, though he would attribute this freedom to divine grace rather than accepting it as a mere donnée or product of happenstance.

The Confessions, with its focus on the self and personal identity, and especially on the self as a cumulative record, inscribed in memory, of our life-altering decisions and events, is conceivably the first existentialist text. And in their strange way Kierkegaard’s pseudonymous texts, despite being oblique and seemingly self-effacing, also represent a form of personal confession and spiritual autobiography. The Pensées stands as an intermediate text in this series, an experiment in autobiographical apologetics linking the direct, confessional style of Augustine with the multiple personae, lyrical vignettes, and pensive fragments typical of Kierkegaard.

That human life without God is wretched and that the human condition is marked by restlessness, ennui, and anxiety is an observation common to all three writers. Another common feature of their work is the recurrent image of a vast gulf or abyss. Augustine compares the human soul to a deep abyss and likens it to the Nothingness preceding the Creation (Genesis 1:2). Without the light of God, he suggests, we are but a dark emptiness. Kierkegaard argues that human freedom necessarily entails a constant sense of anxiety, and his image of our condition is that of a person standing on the edge of a dark precipice. Pascal’s dread of the silence of infinite space (201/233) and similar images in the Pensées of void and darkness echo these sentiments. And in the background of this imagery also stands the legend of his personal idée fixe – that is, his feeling that he was constantly shadowed by a personal abyss. (This legend relates to the aforementioned story of his accident on the Pont de Neuilly when his coach supposedly almost plunged into the Seine – an unconfirmed but oft-retold event that has been perpetuated and basically permanently enshrined in Baudelaire’s poem “Le Gouffre” and in Freud’s writings on obsession.)

In the Confessions Augustine describes the long ordeal that eventually leads to his conversion. But his narrative doesn’t end at that point. Instead, he must begin a new spiritual test and journey – that of actually living a Christian life. Similarly, Kierkegaard never wrote of being a Christian, but always of becoming one. He regarded an authentic Christian life as a constant trial and task. Like Augustine, Pascal places even harsher spiritual demands on himself after his conversion. And like Kierkegaard, he believes that true Christianity is an ever-striving imitatio Christi, a continual remaking of oneself in the image and spirit of Jesus.

With these resemblances in mind, it’s hardly a stretch to say that entire portions of the Pensées, translated into Latin or Danish, could easily pass for an excerpt from Augustine or from Kierkegaard’s Training in Christianity or another of the author’s “edifying” texts. Similarly, if we place Pascal in a sequence of “Christian existentialist” writers, a line that arguably proceeds from Augustine to Kierkegaard and then on to, say, Unamuno and Berdyaev, we find the same emphasis on personal experience and individual freedom and responsibility; the same rhetorical skill and verbal flourishes; the same flair for metaphor and self-dramatization. In short, if we accept existentialism as not so much a system or body of doctrine, but as more of a perspective or attitude towards life – an exacting and indeed tragic sense of life (depicted graphically and with Dostoyevsky-like force in fragment 434/686) – then Pascal can be considered an existentialist philosopher.

7. Conclusion: Pascal’s Reputation and Cultural Legacy

 “Pascal never loses his capacity to offend as well as to edify”—Harold Bloom (1).

 “How few,” wrote Walter Pater in what was to be his last work, a sparkling critical essay on Pascal, “how select, are the literary figures who have earned the honor of receiving regular ongoing criticism, both appreciative and deprecatory, from their successors.” Pascal has earned that honor and is of that rare and select company, having acquired during the nearly four centuries since his birth a long line of admirers and detractors, including many of the leading names in world literature. Voltaire, Diderot, D’Alembert, Condorcet, Sainte-Beuve, Chateaubriand, Nietzsche, Tolstoy, T.S. Eliot, Borges, Bertrand Russell, Paul Valéry, Harold Bloom – the list of important writers and thinkers who have studied Pascal and gone on to voice their appreciation or discontent could be extended literally for pages.

In his introductory essay to the Pensées published in 1933, Eliot referred to Pascal as “one of those writers who will be and who must be studied afresh by men in every generation. It is not he who changes, but we who change. It is not our knowledge of him that increases, but our world that alters and our attitudes towards it.” (355)

For some reason Eliot assumed that our knowledge of Pascal was basically complete eighty years ago and that modern scholarship would do little to alter or augment our understanding of his life and work. On this point he was quite mistaken. In fact, on the contrary, owing to the biographical and textual labors of scholars like Lafuma, Sellier, and Mesnard, students of Pascal today have a much fuller understanding of the author’s personal life, family, medical history, intellectual and religious development, and social milieu, as well as a far better sense of the likely order, design, and method of the Pensées, than any previous generation of readers.

Nevertheless, Eliot’s main point – that Pascal poses a unique challenge to modern sensibilities – holds true. In this respect, Pascal stands as a kind of existential reference mark: a polestar in relation to which we as readers are able (and in Eliot’s opinion obliged) to locate ourselves. He remains a fixed point against which we are challenged to measure the sincerity and durability of our own values and beliefs.

Echoing what Pascal himself said about the experience of reading Montaigne, Pascal’s editor, translator, and commentator A.J. Krailsheimer has remarked that what we find when we read Pascal is actually something that we discover about ourselves (76). In effect, what both Krailsheimer and Eliot are suggesting is that ultimately there is not one Pascal, but many – possibly as many as there are readers of his texts. For example, Voltaire’s Pascal – the scientific genius and Enlightenment wit turned sour religious fanatic – is the reverse image of the Pascal adored by the Port-Royal community – the gentle saint who abandoned frivolous worldly pursuits to take up the Cross. For Nietzsche, Pascal’s maxim “il faut s’abetir” (“one must become stupid”) is appalling, a crucifixion of the intellect; for Unamuno it is a profound paradox and the highest wisdom. Valéry’s Pascal is a sententious and badgering preacher, oblivious to the beauty of nature; the Pascal of Sainte-Beuve is an “athlete, martyr, and hero of the invisible moral world.” What Gilberte Perier refers to as her brother’s “second conversion,” Bertrand Russell regards as an act of “philosophical suicide.” And so on. In short, Pascal’s writings, and especially the Pensées, have served less as a window into the author’s soul than as a kind of mirror or prism reflecting the different outlooks and opinions of his readers.

Of course any proper summation of Pascal’s cultural legacy must include his contributions to probability theory and game theory and his invention of the mechanical computer (in honor of which the Swiss computer scientist Niklaus Wirth aptly named his new programming language Pascal). And, one must include all the other eponymous scientific, mathematical, and theological concepts (Pascal’s Theorem, Pascal’s Principle, Pascal’s Triangle, Pascal’s Wager, and so forth) that bear his name. In addition, every modern system of intra-urban or inter-urban shuttle transportation also owes a debt to the philosopher, who first conceived such a system and oversaw its original implementation in the city of Paris.

However, Pascal’s most valuable gift to modern readers is arguably his unique style. His combination of wit, irony, and aphorism, his ease and clarity, his air of someone skilled both in urbane conversation and erudite technical debate was to a large extent already present and on dazzling display in Montaigne. The same features reappear in the writings of Voltaire and the philosophes. And today, thanks largely to Pascal, these attributes have become a part of French literary tradition. However, what sets Pascal’s style apart, especially in the Pensées, is that supplemental to his characteristic élan and luster he adds a tone of existential angst: a visionary quality, together with an element of strangeness that is utterly foreign to the works of Montaigne and Voltaire but which appears powerfully in writers like Dante, Kafka, and Borges. Pascal’s imagination, like theirs, seems haunted by the notion of infinity and by images of mystery and turmoil; by circles, mazes, precipices, and abysses:

“At the far end of an infinite distance a coin is being spun . . .” 418/680.

 “Nature is an infinite sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere” 199/230.

Relatively few writers, and certainly few philosophers, have his uncanny quality, using that term in Freud’s sense as the ability to make familiar ideas seem strange and strange ideas seem familiar. Pater rightly called him the intellectual equivalent of lightning.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Texts and translations of works by Pascal

  • Faugère, Prosper, ed. The Miscellaneous Writings of Pascal (consisting of Letters, Essays, Conversations, and Miscellaneous Thoughts). George Pearce, tr. London: Longman, Brown, Green, and Longmans, 1849.
  • Mesnard, Jean, ed. Œuvres complètes de Pascal. 4 vols. (to date). Paris: Desclée de Brouwer, 1964-1992.
  • Pascal, Blaise, Gilberte Pascal Périer, and Louis Lafuma (ed). Oeuvres Complètes. Paris: Seuill, 1980.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Thoughts, Letters, and Opuscules. O. W. Wright, tr. New York: Hurd and Houghton, 1869.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Provincial LettersPenséesScientific Treatises. Chicago: Encyclopedia Britannica, 1952.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées. Roger Ariew, trans. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 2004.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées. AJ Krailsheimer, trans. New York: Penguin Books, 1995.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées and Other Writings. Honor Levi, trans. Anthony Levi, ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Provincial Letters, translated by Hilaire Belloc, Catholic Truth Society, 1921.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Édition de Pascal, Provinciales, Pensées et opuscules divers. Phillipe Sellier and G. Ferryrolles, eds. Paris: La Pochothèque, 2004.
  • Pascal, Jacqueline, Gilberte Pascal Périer, and Marguerite Périer. Lettres, opuscules et mémoires de madame Perier et de Jacqueline, soeurs de Pascal, et de Marguerite Perier, sa nièce: Publiés sur les manuscrits originaux par M. P. Faugère. Armand Prosper Faugère, ed. Paris: Auguste Vaton, 1845. (Elibron Classics replica edition, 2001.)

b. Biographical and critical studies

  • Bishop, Morris. Pascal: The Life of Genius. New York: Reynel & Hitchcock, 1936.
  • Bloom, Harold, ed. Blaise Pascal: Modern Critical Views. New York: Chelsea House, 1989.
  • Borges, Jorge Luis. “Pascal’s Sphere.” In Selected Non-Fictions. New York: Penguin Books, 1999.
  • Boyle, Robert. Hydrostatical Paradoxes: Made Out by New Experiments. Oxford: William Hall, 1666.
  • Cobb, William Frederick. “Pascal.” In James Hastings and John A. Selbie, eds. The Encyclopedia of Religion and Ethics, Part 18. Reprint. Whitefish, MT: Kessinger Publishing, 2003. 645-657.
  • Cousin, Victor. Études sur Pascal. 5th edition. Paris, Didier, 1857. Digitized by Google Books.
  • Davidson, Hugh M. Blaise Pascal. Boston: Twayne, 1983.
  • Edward, AWF. Pascal’s Arithmetical Triangle: The Story of a Mathematical Idea. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 2002.
  • Eliot, T.S. “The Pensées of Pascal.” Selected Essays. New York: Harcourt, Brace, and World, 1964; 355-368.
  • Faugere, Prosper. Génie et Écrits de Pascal. Paris, 1847. Digitized by Google Books.
  • Goldmann, Lucien. The Hidden God: A Study of Tragic Vision in the Pensées of Pascal and the Tragedies of Racine. Tr. Philip Thody. Brill, 1964.
  • Guardini, Romano. Pascal for Our Time. New York: Herder and Herder, 1966.
  • Hammond, Nicholas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Pascal. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • James, William. “The Will to Believe.” In Religion from Tolstoy to Camus. Walter Kaufmann, ed.  New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 2002. 221-238.
  • Jones, Matthew. The Good Life in the Scientific Revolution: Descartes, Pascal, Leibniz and the Cultivation of Virtue. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2006.
  • Kearns, Edward John. Ideas in Seventeenth-Century France. Manchester, UK: Manchester University Press, 1979.
  • Krailsheimer, A.J. Pascal. New York: Hill and Wang, 1980.
  • Melzer, Sara E. Discourse of the Fall: A Study of Pascal’s Pensées. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1986.
  • Mesnard, Jean. Pascal. Claude and Marcia Abraham, tr. Tuscaloosa, AL: University of Alabama Press, 1969.
  • Mesnard, Jean. Pascal: His Life and Works. London: Harvill Press, 1952.
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Author Information

David Simpson
Depaul University
U. S. A.

Antoine Arnauld (1612—1694)

Antoine Arnauld was considered by his peers as one of the preeminent 17th century European intellectuals. Arnauld had been remembered primarily as a correspondent of René Descartes, Gottfried Leibniz and Nicolas Malebranche, and as a dogmatic and uncritical Cartesian who made few if any philosophical contributions. In fact, as much newer research suggests, Arnauld was not a dogmatic and uncritical Cartesian, and he made many philosophical contributions over and above facilitating the development of the philosophical systems of Descartes, Leibniz and Malebranche.

Arnauld’s primary endeavors were largely theological. Indeed, the 18th Century Enlightenment thinker Voltaire wrote of Arnauld that “there was no one with a more philosophical mind, but his philosophy was corrupted” because, among other things, he “plunged 60 years in miserable disputes” (Voltaire 1906, p. 728/Kremer 1990, p. xi). In other words, Voltaire claims that Arnauld wasted his time on religious disputes and theology instead of focusing on philosophy. While it is controversial (to say the least) whether Arnauld’s primary intellectual endeavors were in fact “miserable disputes,” it is certainly true that Arnauld devoted the majority of his efforts and writings to theological and religious questions. Arnauld is likely the figure most associated with a sect of Catholicism prominent in France in the 17th Century called Jansenism (other than Cornelius Jansen for whom Jansenism is so named, see section 1).

However, despite his focus on theological and religious issues, Arnauld was a major figure in the philosophical landscape of the latter half of the 17th century. Arnauld burst onto the philosophical scene in 1641, when he authored the Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations on First Philosophy. After Descartes had finished the manuscript of the Meditations, he sent it to Marin Mersenne to acquire comments from leading intellectuals of the day in Paris, including Thomas Hobbes and Pierre Gassendi. In the eyes of many (Descartes included), Arnauld’s are the best set of objections.

In the 1660’s Arnauld co-authored several philosophical works with others, none more influential and important than the Port-Royal Logic, sometimes called the Art of Thinking. In this work, Arnauld and co-author Pierre Nicole, offer a sophisticated account of reasoning well, which for these thinkers encompassed not just what we might associate with logic proper today, but also issues concerning the nature of ideas, metaphysics, philosophical methodology and ontology. Arnauld corresponded with Gottfried Leibniz in the 1680’s concerning an outline of what would later become one of Leibniz's most influential works, the Discourse on Metaphysics. Arnauld also corresponded with Nicolas Malebranche in a very public controversy. In fact, this controversy has been called “one of the intellectual events of the [17th] century,” which covered, among other things the nature of ideas and the nature of God (Nadler 1996, p. 147). This article focuses on those texts and positions of Arnauld’s that are of the most philosophical interest.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. The Life of Arnauld
    2. Philosophical Works
    3. The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld Polemic
  2. Arnauld's Cartesianism
  3. The Fourth Objections
  4. The Nature of Arnauld’s Cartesianism
  5. Arnauld's Cartesian Ontology: Dual Dualisms
  6. Philosophical Methodology
  7. Occasionalism
  8. Conception of God and Theodicy
    1. The Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths
    2. Theodicy
    3. Arnauld’s God
  9. Modality
  10. Conclusion
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

a. The Life of Arnauld

Antoine Arnauld, often referred to as “le grand Arnauld” on account of his small physical stature, was first and foremost a theologian (Sedgwick 1998, p. 124). He was born on February 6th, 1612 into a well-regarded family in Paris. After briefly considering following his late father and pursuing a career in law, Arnauld decided, largely at the bequest of his mother and family friend (and friend of Cornelius Jansen) Jean Duvergier, to pursue a life in theology and the Church (Kremer 1990, pp. xiv; Nadler 1989, pp. 15-16). In 1633, Arnauld began his studies at the Sorbonne in Paris and both received his doctorate in theology and became an ordained priest in 1641. Arnauld would go on to ultimately serve on the faculty of the Sorbonne (Nadler 1989, p. 16).

Arnauld’s life was tied to Jansenism and the monastery of Port-Royal. Port-Royal was a convent in France that shifted between two locations (and sometimes both), one just outside of Paris and one in Paris – Port Royal du Champs and Port Royal de Paris respectively. (Sleigh 1990, pp. 26-27). The Port-Royal was associated with Jansenism and was dedicated to intellectual pursuits and notably the education of children (Sleigh 1990, p. 27).

Jansenism is a now defunct sect of Catholicism that sought reform within the Roman Catholic Church. Indeed, many of Jansenism's critics argued that Jansenism was actually a brand of Protestantism and called the movement Jansenism to relate it to Calvinism, so named from John Calvin (Schmaltz 1999, p. 42). Jansenism developed out of the ideas of Cornelius Jansen and his book Augustinus. As the title suggests, Jansen defended an Augustinian inspired system. It is hard to outline many characteristics over and above being inspired by Jansen’s text and their views on grace that are representative of Jansenism or those associated with the Port-Royal (see, for example, Schmaltz 1999). For example, while the Port-Royal had long been associated with Cartesianism, recent research suggests that many associated with the Port-Royal were in fact anti-Cartesian (see, for example, Nadler 1988b). Nevertheless, the central claim of the Jansenist cause that occupies much of Arnauld’s attention at points in his career and plays a fundamental role in several of Arnauld's most interesting philosophical contributions is the Augustinian doctrine of efficacious grace. This doctrine of efficacious grace held that one did not achieve salvation by one’s own merit, but only through the grace of God. Further, if one received God’s grace, one could not fail to achieve salvation. In other words, grace was given (or not given) by God and not earned by one’s own actions (Nadler 1989, p. 16 and Nadler 2008b, pp. 56-57). A second aspect of Jansenist doctrine (or at least Arnauld’s Jansenism) that plays a central role in Arnauld’s philosophical endeavors is a commitment to a “hidden God” (Moreau 2000, p. 106). By a “hidden God”, Arnauld at least, does not mean to claim that God’s works are unknowable or that we can know nothing about God, but rather that in some very substantive ways God is not fully comprehendible by us (see section 5).

Arnauld had a fundamental role in the “Quarrel over the Five Propositions”. In 1653, Pope Innocent X declared the following five propositions heretical. All five of these, the Pope claimed, were endorsed by Jansen in Augustinus:

  1. Some commandments of God are impossible for righteous men, although they wish to fulfill them and strive to fulfill them in accord with the power they presently possess. They lack the grace that would make it possible.
  2. In the state of fallen nature, interior grace is never resisted.
  3. In order to deserve merit or demerit in the state of fallen nature, freedom from necessity is not required in men; rather, freedom from constraint is sufficient.
  4. The Semi-Pelagians admitted the necessity of prevenient and interior grace for each action, even for the beginning of faith; but they were heretics in that they held hat this grace is such that the human will can either resist it or obey it.
  5. It is an error of the Semi-Pelagians to say that Christ dies or that he shed his blood for everyone without exception. [See, for example, Sleigh (1990), p. 27, from whom the translations are taken]

Arnauld refused to submit to Papal authority and accept that Jansen’s text was heretical. While Arnauld granted that the Pope had the authority to decide what was or was not heretical, he denied that the Pope had a similar authority in interpreting Augustinus. In fact, Arnauld argued, Jansen endorses none of these propositions in Augustinus. This incident between the Pope and Jansenists like Arnauld, resulted in much persecution for Arnauld and other Jansenists and those who did not submit to Papal authority. Further, as a result of this incident, Arnauld was removed from the faculty of the Sorbonne in 1656 (Kremer 1990, pp. xv-xvi and Sleigh 1990, pp. 27-28). In 1679, Arnauld went into exile in the Netherlands, during which time he even used a fake name (Monsieur Davy) and never returned to France (Sleigh 1990, p. 26/Jacques 1976, p. 34]. Arnauld died August 8th 1694, in Liège.

[For more information on the life of Arnauld and from which the above account is taken, see especially: Nadler (1989) Chapter II; Kremer (1990); Sleigh (1990) Chapter 3; and Sedgwick (1998), especially Chapter 7. For a general book length-study of 17th Century French Jansenism, see Sedgwick (1977)].

b. Philosophical Works



In the course of his life, Arnauld wrote a substantial amount on both theology and philosophy. Those philosophical writings that are of the most importance are briefly discussed here.

While studying at the Sorbonne, Arnauld authored the aforementioned Fourth Objections to Descartes’ Meditations. In November of 1640, Descartes asked Marin Mersenne (who was the center of the Parisian intellectual world) to circulate copies of the Meditations among other thinkers in Paris to acquire comments and objections so that Descartes could publish them with the first printing of the Meditations. While the group of objectors included Pierre Gassendi, Thomas Hobbes and Marin Mersenne, Descartes claimed of Arnauld’s objections, “I think they are the best of all the sets of objections” (CSMK III 175/AT III 331). Arnauld’s objections to the Mediations have many distinctive features. For example, unlike the objections of Hobbes and Gassendi, Arnauld’s objections to the Meditations are not objections to Descartes’ system, but objections internal to Descartes’ system. Further, Arnauld’s objections resulted in changes in the actual body of the Meditations (see for example, Carraud 1995, pp. 110-111). Some of Arnauld’s objections are discussed below (section 2a). In addition to the Fourth Objections and Fourth Replies, Arnauld and Descartes exchanged two letters each in 1648 wherein Arnauld further presses Descartes on matters related to the Cartesian philosophy (although it is worth noting that Arnauld remained anonymous in these letters). These two letters are often called “The New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations” (and are available in English translation in Kremer’s translation of On True and False Ideas 1990). In these works, Arnauld pushes Descartes for further clarification of central aspects of the Cartesian worldview while simultaneously showing sympathy to that worldview.

Arnauld co-authored works with other Port-Royalists, two of which deserve special mention. The first of these is the Port-Royal Grammar. In this 1660 work Arnauld and co-author Claude Lancelot, construct a general text on grammar, which they define as “the art of speaking” (PRG 41/OA 41 5). They define speaking as “explaining one’s thoughts by signs which men have invented for that purpose” (PRG 41/OA 41 5). In 1662, Arnauld co-wrote a similar work called La Logique, ou L’art de Penser, that is The Logic or the Art of Thinking (henceforth: Logic) with Pierre Nicole. Arnauld and Nicole understand the purpose of logic to “give rules for all actions of the mind, and for simple ideas as well as for judgments and inferences” (B 15/OA 41 27). Thus, Arnauld and Nicole aim to produce a text based on reasoning well and making good judgments. Arnauld and Nicole divide the text into four parts: conceiving, judging, reasoning and ordering. Conceiving is “the simple view we have of things that present themselves to the mind” and is what we do when we represent things to the mind in the form of ideas before making judgments about them. Judging is the act of bringing together different ideas in the mind and affirming or denying one or the other. Reasoning is the “action of the mind in which it forms a judgment from several others.” Ordering (or method) is the mental action of arranging “ideas, judgments and reasonings” in such a way that the arrangement is “best suited for knowing the subject” (B 23/OA 41 125). The Logic is very influential. So influential, in fact, it has been claimed that “The Port-Royal Logic was the most influential logic from Aristotle to the end of the nineteenth century” (Buroker 1996, p. xxiii). Further, while the text is ostensibly one about logic, it also treats extensively metaphysics, philosophy of language, epistemology, theory of ideas and philosophy of religion.

Arnauld wrote a majority of his philosophical work while in exile. In Examen d’un Ecrit qui a pour titre: Traité de l’essence du the corps, et de l’union de l’âme avec le corps, contre la philosophie de M. Descartes, that is, an Examination of a Writing that has for a title: Treatise on the essence of the body, and the union of the soul with the body, against the philosophy of Mr. Descartes (henceforth Examen), Arnauld responds to an attack on Cartesianism by M. Le Moine, Dean of the Chapter of Vitre. The treaty to which Arnauld is responding is now lost (Schmaltz 2002, p. 54; Nadler 1989, p. 26, n 18). In this work, Arnauld defends a Cartesian philosophy, though not an entirely orthodox Cartesianism (see section 4). Arnauld divided the text into four sections: whether Descartes’ philosophy can add anything valuable over and above what scripture tells us; that Descartes’ philosophy is consistent with the Catholic stance on the Eucharist – a Catholic ceremony in which wine and bread are blessed by a priest and the wine and bread, which in the 17th century are taken to either be converted into, or annihilated and replaced by, Christ’s blood and body (see, for example, Nadler 1988, p. 230); that Descartes does not ruin the Church’s belief in the glory of the body; and on the union of the soul and the body. [For a thorough treatment of Arnauld, Descartes and the Eucharist, see Nadler (1988) and Schmaltz (2002), Chapter 1]. The Examen (1680) is especially notable as Arnauld was explicitly defending a Cartesian philosophy, even after Descartes’ works were condemned by the Congregation of the Index in 1663. To have one’s works condemned by the Congregation of the Index was having them being banned by the Catholic Church (see for example, Nadler 1988, p. 239).

c. The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld Polemic


In addition to the philosophical works described above, Arnauld participated in two events in the 17th century of immense importance, namely the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence and the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic. The most famous part of the correspondence with Leibniz (indeed the part normally referred to as the “Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence”) began in February of 1686 when Leibniz wrote to the Landgrave Ernst von Hessen-Rheinfels. Leibniz sent an outline of what would become one of Leibniz's most important works, the Discourse on Metaphysics, and asked if the Landgrave could give the outline to Arnauld in hopes that Arnauld would comment on it. Arnauld and Leibniz then corresponded with Hessen-Rheinfels as an intermediary. Arnauld’s initial response to Leibniz gives some justification of his reputation as a harsh critic and hot-tempered person. Arnauld claims that Leibniz’s work contains “so many things that frighten me and that almost all men, if I am not mistaken, will find so shocking, that I do not see what use such a work can be, which will clearly be rejected by everybody” (M 9/G II 15). Arnauld adds “Would it not be better if he [Leibniz] abandoned these metaphysical speculations which cannot be of use to him or others, in order to apply himself seriously to the greatest business that he can ever have, the assurance of his salvation by returning to the Church” (M 10/G II 16). In Arnauld’s second letter to Leibniz, he apologizes and offers a more thorough account of what he found so troubling in Leibniz’s philosophy.  It is this letter that begins a philosophical exchange whose rigor rivals the best published philosophical works of the period.

The correspondence had a profound effect on the development of Leibniz’s metaphysical system, so much so that Leibniz considered publishing the correspondence (G I 420, see also Sleigh 1990, p. 1). Further, as we shall see below, Arnauld offers some original contributions in the discussion, most notably concerning modal metaphysics or the nature of possibility. However, it is worth briefly noting two of Arnauld’s objections to Leibniz’s system before we move on. First, Arnauld objects to Leibniz’s account of pre-established harmony. In the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz defends pre-established harmony or as Arnauld refers to it “the hypothesis of the concomitance and harmony between substances” (M 78/G II 64). Leibniz’s view, in brief, is that each substance causes all of its own changes and there is no causation or causal relations between two distinct finite substances. Instead, according to Leibniz, God has set up the universe so that at the exact moment that, for example, Arnauld speaks to Leibniz, Leibniz’s own substance changes itself in such a way that Leibniz hears Arnauld. For example, in the Discourse Leibniz claims:

We could therefore say...that one particular substance never acts upon another particular substance nor is acted upon by it. (AG 47/G IV 358)


God alone (from whom all individuals emanate continually and who sees the universe not only as they see it but also entirely different from all of them) is the cause of the correspondence of their phenomena and makes that which is particular to one of them public to all of them; otherwise, there would be no interconnection. (AG 47/G IV 375)

Arnauld pushes Leibniz to clarify his view (M 78/G II 64) and then argues that Leibniz’s view collapses into a different account of causation prevalent in the 17th century: occasionalism (M 105-106/G II 84-85). The traditional doctrine of occasionalism, most closely associated with the Cartesian Nicolas Malebranche, is the conjunction of the following two claims:

  1. Finite beings have no causal power.
  2. God is the only true causal agent.

According to occasionalism, only God has causal power. When it appears to us that a baseball breaks a window, it is not the case that the baseball (a finite thing) exercises any causal efficacy over the window. Instead, God, on the occasion of the baseball striking the window, causes the window to break. The baseball in this case is often called an “occasional cause”.  However, one should not mistake an occasional cause as something with causal power, rather it simply signifies the occasion for God to exercise His causal power. Returning to Arnauld’s objection to Leibniz, he explains:

It seems to me that this [the concomitance and harmony between substances] is saying the same thing in other words as those who claim that my will is the occasional cause of the movement of my arm and God is the real cause. For they do not claim that God does that in time through a new act of will which he exercises each time I wish to raise my arm; but by that single act of the eternal will (M 105-106/G II 84).

Arnauld’s concern is that if substances are not causally affecting each other, and the correspondence of seeming causal relations occurs only because of God setting it up so that these relations correspond, how could this view be any different than claiming that only God is causally efficacious? We might restate Arnauld’s question as follows: Given that God wills things, not one at a time, but from a single eternal will, how is it any different for God to will from a single act of the eternal will that all ‘interactions’ between different substances correspond with no actual causal relations between them and for God to will the relations between the two substances themselves?

Arnauld may have misunderstood Leibniz in this regard [see, for example, Sleigh (1990), p. 150], as Leibniz would claim that each substance causes its own changes and insist that this is substantively different from occasionalism. However, Arnauld’s objections to Leibniz, at the least, push Leibniz to explain his view, and at best do not suffer from and rely on a misunderstanding of Leibniz’s position and offer a legitimate problem for Leibniz’s view.

Arnauld also criticizes Leibniz’s account substances. According to Leibniz, each created substance has a certain ‘form’ that constitutes its essence (see, for example, Sleigh 1990, p. 116). A full (or even adequate) account of Leibniz on this issue would take us on a long detour. For our purposes we can focus on one particular aspect of what Leibniz says:

If the body is a substance…[and not] an entity united by accident or by aggregation like a heap of stones, it cannot consist of extension, and one must necessarily conceive of something there that one calls a [form], and which corresponds in a way to a soul. (M 66/G II 58)

Take for example a human body. We naturally think of the human body, say Arnauld’s body, as an individual thing with some sort of unity or togetherness. According to Descartes and Arnauld (see section 2c) bodies are essentially extended things and are infinitely divisible. That is, for any body, that body can be divided into an infinite number of parts. Leibniz claims in this passage that if there are extended bodies they cannot be simply things like heaps of stone or simple aggregates. There must be something that unifies the body and this thing Leibniz says corresponds in a way to the soul. The “if” is quite important for Leibniz, for Leibniz seems to be acknowledging the possibility of physical substances being merely “true phenomenon like the rainbow” (see for example M 95/G II 77, Parkinson 1967, pp. xxvi-xxvii and Sleigh 1990, pp. 101-110). Leibniz’s comparison of the potential for physical substances being like a rainbow suggests that such substances might very well be nothing but phenomenon. Nevertheless, Leibniz denies that an extended substance could exist without some “form” providing it a unity.

Arnauld offers numerous arguments against Leibniz’s conception of “forms”. Indeed, as pointed out by Parkinson (1967, p. xxvi), Arnauld makes at least 7 distinct objections to this concept. Several of Arnauld’s objections include: denying that he has any clear notion of what such a “form” is (M 134/G II 107); that he only has knowledge of two types of substances, minds and bodies, and it does not make sense to call these “forms” minds or bodies (M 134-135/G II 107-108); and even that if these “forms” did exist, Leibniz’s account of them is indefensible (M 135/G II 108).

[For a general discussion of Arnauld and Leibniz’s discussion of “forms”, see Sleigh (1990), Chapter 6. For an excellent book-length treatment of the entire Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence see Sleigh (1990), and for a shorter treatment see Parkinson (1967)].

Arnauld also engaged in a decade long public dispute with Malebranche over the nature of ideas and account of God and God’s modus operandi. The debate between Arnauld and Malebranche should be interpreted as a debate between two Cartesians, who have strayed from the letter of Descartes in different ways. The public and private debate between Malebranche and Arnauld consists in many works and letters. The controversy began with Malebranche’s publication of the Treatise on Nature and Grace (henceforth: Treatise). Initially, prior to publication, Malebranche had sent the work to Arnauld for his opinion. However, Malebranche then decided to publish the Treatise without waiting to hear back from Arnauld. This event clearly irked Arnauld and is likely the beginning of the polemic (see Moreau 2000, p. 88 and OA 2 95, OA 2 101 and OA 2 116). In the Treatise, Malebranche offers a theodicy, or an attempt to reconcile the existence of an all-good, all-knowing, all-powerful God with the existence of evil. Prima facie, it seems that an all-powerful, all-good, all-knowing God could create a world with no evil (given all-power), would desire to create such a world (given all-goodness) and would know how to create such a world (given all-knowing). Malebranche offers a highly original theodicy. Malebranche’s theodicy and Arnauld’s objections are discussed in section 5b in regard to Arnauld’s conception of God and theodicy.

Arnauld vigorously responds to Malebranche’s view in print and then the two exchange numerous writings and compose many books arguing against each other for the next ten years (for an overview of the chronology of the debate, see Moreau 2000, pp. 88-92). Three of Arnauld’s works which are of much importance are On True and False Ideas (henceforth: VFI; from the French title: Des vraies et des fausses idées), Réflexions philosophiques et théologiques sur le noveau système de la nature et de la grace, that is, Philosophical and theological relfections on the new system of nature and grace (henceforth: Réflexions) and Dissertation sur la manière dont Dieu a fait les fréquents miracles de l’Ancienne Loi par le ministre des Anges, that is, Dissertation on the manner in which God has made frequent miracles of the Ancient Law by the minister of the Angles (henceforth: Dissertation). [Unfortunately, only the former is currently available in English and even it has only been available in English since 1990, see Kremer (1990), p. xii]. In the latter two, Arnauld goes after Malebranche’s theodicy and conception of God. VFI (1683) was Arnauld’s first contribution to the debate. Curiously, it does not address Malebranche theodicy or the Treatise (the work that started the polemic), but rather Arnauld offers an attack on Nicholas Malebranche’s The Search After Truth, specifically the theory of ideas there presented.

Malebranche offered a very distinct indirect realist theory of ideas. Malebranche’s account of ideas and perception is not always straightforward and not without its own interpretative issues. However, in brief, according to Malebranche, ideas are distinct things independent of the mind and objects that they represent. Further, when a person considers an idea, say of an extended body, the direct and immediate object of my thought is an idea, not the extended body itself. One only has indirect perception of the extended body. Malebranche also holds that these ideas are in an interesting sense “in God.” For Malebranche in human knowledge and perception the human mind perceives an idea and this idea is found in the divine understanding and is God’s idea [See, for example, The Search After Truth book III, part ii, chapters 1-7; PS 27-50 and Nadler (1992), pp. 98-99 from whom this account is indebted. For more elaborate discussions of Malebranche’s account of ideas, see Nadler (1992) and Schmaltz (2000)].

Arnauld vigorously opposed Malebranche’s account of ideas. It is clear that Arnauld argues against Malebranche’s view that there exist objects independent of our perception in God that play a role in our perception. Further, Steven Nadler (1989) has persuasively (although perhaps not definitely) argued that Arnauld was arguing against any indirect realist conception of ideas and instead offered an account in which ideas are modes of the mind and acts of perception such that the direct object of any perception is the thing which is perceived.

While the majority of the attention the Arnauld-Malebranche debate has received has concerned the theory of ideas, the majority of the debate has actually concerned theodicy and God. In the Réflexions and Dissertation, for example, Arnauld argues directly against Malebranche’s conception of God and theodicy, and Malebranche’s account of the order of providence.

This account of the correspondence brings us to an interesting question. While Arnauld’s main target was Malebranche’s theodicy and account of God’s modus operandi, Arnauld begins his attack on a seemingly unrelated issue, namely Malebranche’s theory of ideas. Why would Arnauld begin his attack on Malebranche’s theodicy with an attack on his theory of ideas? Recently, Denis Moreau has offered a very plausible explanation for this fact, an explanation that we will be in a position to consider in section 5b.

Though not addressed below, two other works that are related to the Arnauld-Malebranche debate that warrant mention are the Dissertatio Bipartitia, that is, Dissertation in Two Parts (1692), and Règle du bon sens, that is, the Rules of Good Sense (1693). The former was written by Arnauld in response to a work by Gommaire Huygens, in which Huygens defends a view similar to Malebranche’s concerning the theory of ideas (see TP 36). The latter was written in response to François Lamy, who at the request of Pierre Nicole (Arnauld’s co-author from the Logic), defended Huygens from Arnauld’s attack in the Dissertatio (see TP 37).

With this brief account of Arnauld’s life and works in hand, we can proceed to the heart of the project.

[For excellent treatments of the Arnauld-Malebranche polemic, see: Moreau (2000); and Nadler (1989). Moreau (2000) is an article length summary of the debate while Nadler (1989) is a book length treatment on the debate concerning ideas. In addition, Moreau (1999) is an excellent book-length treatment of the debate, though it is only available in French.]

2. Arnauld's Cartesianism

In the Introduction it was claimed that it is a mistake to view Arnauld simply as an uncritical Cartesian, one who endorses Descartes' positions and offers no critical evaluation, advancement or original contributions. Nevertheless, Arnauld's philosophy was thoroughly Cartesian and his commitment to Cartesian is so fundamental to his philosophy that a section on Arnauld's Cartesianism is in order. We begin with a discussion of the Fourth Objections as this is both one of Arnauld’s earliest philosophical works and involves Arnauld directly responding to Descartes’ Meditations. Then we proceed to discuss the nature of Arnauld’s Cartesianism and finally Arnauld’s commitment to a basic Cartesian ontology.

a. The Fourth Objections


As discussed above, Arnauld was one of the authors of the Objections to Descartes’ Meditations. Arnauld’s objections, the Fourth Objections, include many objections that are of central importance, both philosophically and because they facilitate Descartes further articulating his own positions. Prior to receiving the manuscript of the Meditations from Mersenne, Arnauld was already familiar with and likely sympathetic to Cartesian philosophy. As he tells Mersenne:

You can hardly be after my opinion of the author, since you already know how highly I rate his outstanding intelligence and exceptional learning (CSM II 138/AT VII 197).

Arnauld was familiar with at least Descartes’ Discourse on Method (published in 1637) as he refers to it in the Fourth Objections (AT VII 199/CSM II 139). Returning to the philosophical content of the Fourth Objections, Arnauld offers many interesting and important objections to Descartes' Meditations, all of which cannot be adequately covered here. Some of the most important ones are addressed below.

The first Arnauld’s objection to Descartes concerns the first argument in the Sixth Meditation for the claim that the mind and the body are really distinct (the one that occurs at AT VII 78/CSM II 54). Roughly, for the mind and body to be really distinct is for the mind to be able to exist without the body and for the body to be able to exist without the mind. Descartes begins the argument in question by claiming that:

(1) I know that everything which I clearly and distinctly understand is capable of being created by God so as to correspond exactly with my understanding of it (AT 78; CSM II 54).

And he continues:

(2) Hence the fact that I can clearly and distinctly understand one thing apart from another is enough to make me certain that the two things are distinct, since they are capable of being separated, at least by God (AT 78; CSM II 54).

And he concludes by claiming:

(3) On the one hand I have a clear and distinct idea of myself, in so far as I am simply a thinking, non-extended thing; and on the other hand I have a distinct idea of body, in so far as this is simply an extended, non-thinking thing (AT 78; CSM II 54).

So, he concludes:

(4) And accordingly, it is certain that I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it (AT 78; CSM II 54).

The correct interpretation of Descartes’ argument is controversial. However, fundamental to the argument is the inference from Descartes’ clear and distinct idea of himself (that is, whatever is essential to him) as a thinking, non-extended thing and his clear and distinct idea of body as an extended, non-thinking thing, to the claim that “I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it”. While Descartes does not give us an explicit definition of what a clear and distinct idea is in the Meditations (he does in the Principles of Philosophy, a text that was written later and so one which Arnauld would have not yet seen at the time of the Fourth Objections), Descartes clearly means an idea that has a certain internal feature such that it is very precise in his mind and strikes him with a certain strength. Descartes’ argument moves from our ability to have a clear and distinct idea of ourselves as thinking non-extended things to the “real distinction” of mind and body. Since we clearly and distinctly perceive that mind and body are separable, then minds and bodies are separable. Thus, central to Descartes’ argument is that our ability to clearly and distinctly conceive of mind and body as separate licenses the inference to the claim that minds and bodies are capable of being separate (or even of actually being separate). [For a more thorough account, see the Article titled “René Descartes: the Mind-Body Distinction” and for various different interpretations of Descartes’ argument see Van Cleve (1983); Wilson (1978); and Rozemond (1998)]

In his treatment of this argument, Arnauld questions the inference from our being able to clearly and distinctly conceive of mind and body as separate to their actually being separable. Arnauld offers what he takes to be a counter-example. He claims:

Suppose someone knows for certain that the angle in a semi-circle is a right angle, and hence that the triangle formed by this angle and the diameter of the circle is right angled. In spite of this, he may doubt, or not yet grasped as certain, that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; indeed he may even deny this if he is misled by some fallacy. But now, if he uses the same argument as that proposed by our illustrious author, he may appear to have confirmation of his false belief, as follows: ‘I clearly and distinctly perceive’, he may say, ‘that the triangle is right-angled’; but I doubt that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; therefore it does not belong to the essence of the triangle that the square on its hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other sides.’ (CSM II 141-142/AT VII 201-202)

Arnauld offers an objection to Descartes’ argument using what Arnauld takes to be a different case with an analogous structure. Arnauld thinks that in his case, the conclusion is clearly untenable and so Descartes’ argument must be mistaken. Arnauld argues that given Descartes’ argument it seems that it is possible for there to be a right triangle in which the square of the hypotenuse is not equal to the sum of the squares of the other two sides, in other words a right triangle that does not reflect Pythagoras’ Theorem. Arnauld argues: imagine someone considers a right triangle, but doubts whether the square of the hypotenuse is equal to the sum of the squares of the other two sides. Arnauld claims that using Descartes’ argument, since one clearly and distinctly conceives of a right triangle without recognizing that it instantiates Pythagoras’ Theorem, then one could conclude that a right triangle could exist that does not instantiate Pythagoras’ Theorem; a conclusion that is surely untenable.

Arnauld suggests that Descartes’ only reply is to claim that he does not clearly and distinctly perceive that the triangle is right angled. Arnauld continues: “But how is my perception of the nature of my mind any clearer than his perception of the nature of a triangle” (CSM II 142/AT VII 202). So, Arnauld suggests, either we can never know when we have a clear and distinct idea or Descartes’ principle suffers some counter-examples. Whether Arnauld’s objection is successful is a difficult question and one that cannot be covered here. However, briefly, it seems that Descartes’ reply to Arnauld is at least prima facie effective (and possibly a central text in offering a proper interpretation of Descartes’ argument). Descartes claims that “we can clearly and distinctly understand that a triangle in a semi-circle is right-angled without being aware that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides” and compares this to “clearly and distinctly perceive[ing] the mind without the body and the body without the mind” (CSM II 158/AT VII 224-225). Van Cleve (1983, p. 39) helpfully explains the difference (what occurs between the ‘ ’ is the content of the clear and distinct perception):

(a)    Clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘A’ without clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘B’

(b)   Clearly and distinctly perceiving ‘A without B’

So, it seems that Descartes is claiming in the case of mind and body that (b) holds. That is, we can have a clear and distinct perception with the content: “mind without body and body without mind”. In Arnauld’s cases, we only have a clear and distinct perception of a “right triangle” such that we fail to notice that it instantiates Pythagoras’ Theorem. In order for Arnauld’s case to be a true counter-example, we would need to be able to have a clear and distinct perception with the content “right triangle that does not instantiate Pythagoras’ Theorem” and Descartes would deny that we have any such perception.

Arnauld’s objection to Descartes seems to still be a central problem for conceivability-based accounts of the epistemology of modality (see, for example, Yablo 1993, p. 2). A conceivability-based account of the epistemology of modality is one in which our epistemic access to modal claims (that is, claims about possibility, essence, necessity, and so forth) are grounded in our faculty of conceiving of certain states of affairs. Indeed, the conceivability-possibility principle holds that if a state of affairs is conceivable, then it is possible. This principle seems ubiquitous in philosophy, not the least in many thought experiments. The problem akin to Arnauld’s objection is coming up with an internally verifiable criterion for the right sort of conceivability that does not admit of counter-examples. Interestingly, Arnauld ultimately would agree with Descartes and accept that clear and distinct perception was sufficient to establish a real distinction between mind and body (see for example, Schmaltz 1996, pp. 14). Arnauld’s objection to Descartes is of central importance, both historically and philosophically.

A second prominent objection from the Fourth Objections concerns the structure of the Meditations. Arnauld was the first to argue that Descartes’ argument in the Meditations is circular. Arnauld claims:

I have one further worry, namely how the author avoids reasoning in a circle when he says that we are sure that what we clearly and distinctly perceive is true only because God exists.

But we can be sure that God exists only because we clearly and distinctly perceive this. Hence, before we can be sure that God exists, we ought to be able to be sure that whatever we perceive clearly and evidently is true. (CSM II 150/AT VII 214)

The worry pointed to by Arnauld has become known as the ‘Cartesian Circle’. Arnauld asks, how can Descartes avoid arguing in a circle when, in the Meditations, he seems to both rely on a certain type of idea, namely clear and distinct ideas, to argue for God’s existence, while at the same time, using God to validate those clear and distinct ideas? In other words, Descartes’ proof for God’s existence depends on Descartes trusting his clear and distinct ideas and he relies on God to validate those clear and distinct ideas. It is possible, however, that there is no such circle in Descartes (indeed, Descartes’ response to Arnauld is key to understanding the Meditations and how Descartes does not argue in a circle). Nevertheless, there are passages that suggest that Descartes argues in a circle. For example, in the Fifth Mediation, Descartes claims: “if I were unaware of God…I should never have true and certain knowledge of anything, but only shifting and changeable opinions” (CSM II 48/AT VII 69). Regardless of one’s take on the Cartesian Circle, it is among the most well-known and oft-written about topics in Descartes scholarship and Arnauld was the first to articulate the worry.

Arnauld goes on to express a concern about Descartes’ dualism. This concern is motivated by the fact that Descartes argues that the mind and the body are entirely different sorts of substances, with nothing in common whatsoever. Arnauld worries that by exaggerating the distinction between the mind and body, Descartes renders the body an overly inconsequential part of our selves claiming “that man is merely a rational soul and the body merely a vehicle for the soul – a view which gives rise to the definition of a man as ‘a soul which makes use of a body’” (CSM II 143/AT VII 203). Arnauld is concerned, with this objection, to make sure that on Descartes’ account the human body is a legitimate whole.

b. The Nature of Arnauld’s Cartesianism


As it has been noted above, Arnauld’s philosophy is clearly Cartesian. However, the extent to which he is a Cartesian is less clear. There are three general accounts of Arnauld’s commitment to Cartesianism. Traditionally, Arnauld had been interpreted as an uncritical and orthodox Cartesian (some readings go so far as to suggest that Arnauld treated Descartes as almost scripture). Marjorie Greene, for example, claims that Arnauld “would indeed prove for more than half a century the defender of pure Cartesian doctrine as he read it” (Grene 1998, p. 172). Other defenders of this general reading (although not as strong as Grene’s claim) include Robinet (1991) and Gouhier (1978). A second reading of Arnauld’s Cartesianism is that Arnauld was a Cartesian merely nominally. That is, the enthusiasm for Cartesian philosophy on the part of Arnauld was merely in so far as it furthered some other ends of Arnauld’s, whether it be to resuscitate interest in the philosophy of Augustine or to further some purely religious doctrines associated with Jansenism. Thus, although Arnauld may have furthered Cartesianism, developed Cartesianism and popularized Cartesianism, to call Arnauld a Cartesian is, in the words of Miel, “to be a dupe to a label” (Miel 1969, p. 262). Third, Arnauld can be seen as a critical and innovative Cartesian. That is, as a philosopher who embraced, to some extent, a Cartesian world-view, but remained critical of Descartes’ views and developed aspects of the Cartesian world-view or abandoned them when he saw fit. The most prominent defenders of this interpretation of Arnauld are Nadler (1995) and Moreau (1999); see also Kremer (1996) and Faye (2005). It seems that the best reading of Arnauld is the third reading. Indeed, the account of Arnauld defended in this article is indicative of the third reading to the extent that Arnauld strays from Descartes on several important issues described below. [For a good discussion of Arnauld’s Cartesianism, see Nadler (1989), Chapter II.]

c. Arnauld's Cartesian Ontology: Dual Dualisms



Arnauld, like Descartes, has two exhaustive and exclusive dualisms at the foundation of his ontology, namely a substance-mode ontology and a mind-body substance dualism. Arnauld’s commitment to a substance-mode ontology is clear in Book I, Chapter 2 of the Logic, where he claims:

I call whatever is conceived as subsisting by itself and as the subject of everything conceived about it, a thing. It is otherwise called a substance.

I call a manner of a thing, or mode, or attribute, or quality, that which, conceived as in the thing and not able to subsist without it, determines it to be a certain way and causes it to be so named.  (B 30/OA 41 46-47).

Arnauld is endorsing a substance-mode Cartesian ontology. Substances have two features. First, a substance is something which subsists by itself. Arnauld explains that by subsisting by itself, a substance needs “no other subject to exist” (B 31/OA 41 47). Arnauld holds that substances have independent ontic existence (relying only on God). The second feature of a substance is that it is the subject of everything conceived about it. That is, whatever features or properties the substance is conceived to have depend on the substance for their existence.

The second ontic category is that of modes. Modes cannot subsist on their own and are in a substance. In another passage Arnauld explains that modes “can exist naturally only through a substance” (Book I, Chapter 7, B 43/OA 41 64). Following Descartes, Arnauld defines modes as those things that rely on other things for their existence. Modes are different ways that substances can be (K 6/OA 38 184).

Arnauld, like Descartes, also endorses substance dualism, or the view that minds and bodies are the only two types of substances. That minds and bodies are the only two types of substances is a favorite example of Arnauld’s throughout the Logic. In Book 1, Chapter 7, he claims “body and mind are the two species of substance.” In Book II, Chapter 15, Arnauld claims “every substance is a body or a mind” (B 42/OA 41 61; B 123/OA 41 161). In fact, Arnauld tells Leibniz “I am acquainted with only two kinds of substances, bodies and minds; and it is up to those who would claim that there are others to prove it to us” (M 134/G II 107). Minds, for Arnauld, are essentially thinking things, while bodies are essentially extended things (see, for example, B 31-32/OA 41 135). In other words, what it is to be a mind just is to be a thinking thing and what it is to be a body just is to be an extended thing.

3. Philosophical Methodology




Another area of Arnauld's philosophy that reveals his commitment to Cartesianism is his philosophical methodology. Two of the most illuminating discussions of Arnauld's methodology occur throughout the Logic (especially Book IV) and the early chapters of VFI.

In Book IV of the Logic, Arnauld lists four rules useful for guarding against error when we try to find the truth in human sciences (L1, for Logic 1, and so forth):

L1. Never accept anything as true that is not known evidently to be so.

L2. Divide each of the difficulties being presented into as many parts as possible, and as may be required to solve them.

L3. To proceed by ordering our thoughts, beginning with the simplest and the most easily known objects, in order to rise step by step, as if by degrees, to knowledge of the most complex, assuming an order even among those that do not precede one another naturally.

L4. Always make enumerations so complete and reviews so comprehensive that we can be sure to leave nothing out. (B 238/OA 41 367-368) In Chapter I of VFI, Arnauld offers seven “rules which we ought to keep in mind in order to seek the truth” (K 3/OA 38 181).

The rules are (V1 for VFI 1, and so forth):

V1. The first is to begin with the simplest and clearest things, such that we cannot doubt about them provided that we pay attention to them.

V2. The second, to not muddy what we know clearly by introducing confused notions in the attempt to explain it further.

V3. The third is not to seek for reasons ad infinitum; but to stop when we know what belongs to the nature of the thing, or at least to be a certain quality of it.

V4. The fourth is not to ask for definitions of terms which are clear in themselves, and which we could only render more obscure by trying to define them, because we could explicate them only by those less clear.

V5. The fifth is not to confuse the questions which ought to be answered by giving the formal cause, with those that ought to be answered by giving the efficient cause, and not to seek the formal cause of the formal cause, which is a source of many errors, but rather to reply at that point by giving the efficient cause.

V6. The sixth is to take care not to think of minds as being like bodies or bodies as being like minds, attributing to one what pertains to the other.

V7. The seventh, not to multiply beings without necessity. (K 3-4/OA 38 181-182)

Later in VFI, Arnauld adds some “axioms” that compliment and/or add to his method. These axioms include (the axiom numbers as listed here do not correspond with the numbers as listed in VFI, A1 for Axiom 1, and so forth):

A1. Nothing should make us doubt something if we know that it is so with entire certainty, no matter what difficulties can be put forward against it.

A2.  Nothing is more certain than our knowledge of what takes place in our soul when we pause there. It is very certain, for example, that I conceive of bodies when I think I conceive of bodies, even though it may not be certain that the bodies that I conceive either truly exist, or are such as I conceive them to be.

A3.  It is certain, either by reason, assuming that God is not a deceiver, or at least by faith, that I have a body and that the earth, the sun, the moon and many other bodies which I know as existing outside of my mind, truly exist outside my mind.

There is much of interest in this set of rules. One aspect that is immediately noticeable is how similar and indebted to Descartes these rules are. Although it would be beyond the scope of this article to offer a full investigation and comparison of Arnauld’s method to Descartes’, there are a few aspects of the relation that are worth noting. Rules L1-L4 are taken from Descartes’ Discourse on Method and identified as such by Arnauld and Nicole. In the Discourse on Method, Descartes offers his method “of rightly conducting one’s reason and seeking truth in the sciences” (CSM I 111/AT VI 1). In the Discourse, Descartes is openly critical of the education (although certainly not entirely dismissive) he received while studying at one of the better schools in Europe at the time. Descartes offers his own rules as a replacement for the method he had been taught (CSM I 120/AT VI 18-19). Descartes is often considered the “Father of Modern Philosophy” and this title is not without merit, at least in part because of his method. Arnauld’s explicit endorsement of the method offered by Descartes in the Discourse on Method shows Arnauld’s embrace of the new method in philosophy.

The rules from VFI are very similar to those from Descartes’ Rules for the Direction of the Mind (henceforth: Rules; CSM I 9-78/AT X 359-472). For example, V1 above is very similar (if not simply a restatement) of Rule 5 of Descartes’ Rules, where Descartes claims that we should “reduce complicated and obscure propositions step by step to simple ones, and then, starting with the intuition of the simplest ones of all try to ascend through the same steps to knowledge of all the rest” (Nadler 1989, p. 34 makes this point). V1 is an explicit mention of Descartes’ Method of Doubt (the method Descartes uses in the Meditations), as Arnauld wants to rely on things that we cannot doubt in his method. In V2, Arnauld warns of not introducing confused notions to understand what we already know clearly. It is further noteworthy that in his explanation of Rule 4, Arnauld explicitly mentions Descartes.

In V6, Arnauld claims that one must be very clear to distinguish between bodies and minds and not attribute what belongs to one to the other. For example, Arnauld would argue that thought pertains to minds and extension belongs to body. It is a mistake to think of bodies as thinking or minds as extended. In V7, Arnauld endorses what is often called Ockham’s Razor, or the principle that one ought not introduce things into one’s ontology when there is no need to do so. This is no doubt in the background of Arnauld’s dismissal of Leibniz’s “forms” discussed in section 1c. Arnauld thinks not only that these forms are vague, but also that they are unhelpful and unnecessary.

In the axioms from VFI, specifically A1, Arnauld claims that “nothing should make us doubt something if we know it with entire certainty” even if this leads to other difficulties. Arnauld employs this principle often in the Logic. For example, in the Logic, Arnauld claims:

How to understand that the smallest bit of matter is infinitely divisible and that one can never arrive at a part that is so small that not only does it not contain several others, but that it does not contain an infinity of parts; that the smallest grain of wheat contains in itself as many parts, although proportionately smaller, as the entire world…all these things are inconceivable, and yet they must necessarily be true, since the infinite divisibility of matter has been demonstrated. (B 231/OA 41 359)

Here Arnauld applies A1 to the claim that matter is infinitely divisible. Arnauld takes it that it has been proven that matter is infinitely divisible. Yet, it is inconceivable how this is so. We should not doubt this, however, no matter what difficulties are put forward concerning it. This is because it has been demonstrated. Arnauld goes on to relate this same principle to God and God’s omnipotence:

The benefit we can derive from these speculations is not just to acquire this kind of knowledge [extension’s being infinitely divisible]…but to teach us to recognize the limits of the mind, and to make us admit in spite of ourselves that some things exist even though we cannot understand them. This is why it is good to tire the mind on these subtleties, in order to master its presumption and to take away its audacity ever to oppose our feeble insight to the truths presented by the Church, under the pretext that we cannot understand them. For since all the vigor of the human mind is forced to succumb to the smallest atom of matter, and to admit that it clearly sees that it is infinitely divisible without being able to understand how that can be, is it not obviously to sin against reason to refuse to believe the marvelous effects of God’s omnipotence, which is itself incomprehensible, for the reason that the mind cannot understand them. (B 233/OA 41 361).

Here, Arnauld claims that God’s omnipotence and it effects are incomprehensible, yet this should not cause of to doubt that God is omnipotent. We shall return to this point in section 5a.

[See Nadler (1989), Chapter II.3 for a great discussion of the methodology and its relation to Cartesianism].

4. Occasionalism

One of the key questions facing Cartesian dualism is how the mind and body, being so radically different, could causally interact. While there is some debate about the exact nature of Descartes’ position, the dominant reading is that he held mind-body interactionism—the view that the mind and body causally interact with one another. As discussed in section 2c, Arnauld also held mind-body substance dualism.  It is not surprising then that Arnauld inherited some of the same questions concerning interaction from Descartes. There is also debate about Arnauld’s view in this respect, and whether Arnauld followed Descartes and embraced interactionism or abandoned interactionism in favor of a version of occasionalism.

As discussed in section 1c, the traditional doctrine of occasionalism has two components:

  1. Finite beings have no causal power.
  2. God is the only true causal agent.

Arnauld clearly rejects both 1 and 2. Arnauld holds that finite minds have causal power. Thus, it may seem odd to attribute occasionalism to Arnauld. However, consider the following two claims:@

  1. Finite minds have no causal power over bodies and bodies have no causal power over minds.
  2. God is the only true causal agent with respect to mind-body causal relations.

The conjunction of 3 and 4, or mind-body occasionalism, is occasionalism with respect to only a certain type of causal relations, namely mind-body causal relations.

The traditional reading of Arnauld is as a mind-body interactionist. The most sophisticated defense of this reading is A. R. Ndiaye’s. He argues that despite his occasionalist vernacular, Arnauld is in the tradition of Descartes, not in the occasionalist tradition (Ndiaye 1991, p. 308).

While Ndiaye’s interpretation deserves treatment, Nadler (1995) has convincingly argued that, at least by the end of his career, Arnauld was a mind-body occasionalist (the following account is taken from Nadler 1995). As pointed out by Nadler, in the Examen Arnauld argues that mental states and bodily states correspond in an interesting way. We have certain mental states, like pain, on the occasion of certain bodily states, like burning flesh. Arnauld argues that such a correspondence needs an explanation; that is, Arnauld claims that there must be some reason for this correlation between certain types of bodily events and certain types of mental states. Arnauld suggests only three possible explanations:

(a) Bodies cause mental states.

(b) The mind causes its own mental states on the occasion of certain bodily states.

(c) God causes mental states on the occasion of certain physical states.

The three options Arnauld gives make perfect sense given Arnauld's mind-body substance dualism. The only created substances that exist are minds and bodies and of course God exists as well. Given that these are the only things that exist, the three above options seem to be the only three possibilities to explain the correspondence between mental states and bodily states (short of coincidence). Either minds are responsible, bodies are responsible or God is responsible. Arnauld begins by denying that bodies cause mental states, arguing:

For the movement of a body can have at most no other real effect than to move another body, I say at most, for possibly it cannot even do that, for who does not see that a body cannot at all have causal relations with a spiritual soul [qui ne voit qu’il n’en peut causer aucun sur une ame spirituelle] which is incapable, by its nature, of being pushed or moved? (E 99/OA 38 146)

Arnauld clearly denies that bodies can exercise causal power over minds. Thus, Arnauld has eliminated the first possibility. Arnauld then proceeds to consider the second possibility and claims that the mind does not cause its own perception on the occasion of certain bodily states, for the mind could not “ha[ve] such a power to give itself all the perceptions of sensible objects” to “produce them so properly and with so marvelous a promptitude” (OA 38 147/E 101/trans. Nadler 1995, p. 135). In other words, the human mind cannot cause the correct sensations so consistently and so unerringly. How would the human mind know what sensations to cause and when? Since Arnauld argues there are only three possibilities (namely a, b and c above) and the first two do not work (namely, a and b), it must be that God causes them:

It only remains for us to understand that it must be that God desired to oblige himself to cause in our soul all the perceptions of sensible qualities every time certain motions occur in the sense organs, according to the laws that he himself has established in nature (emphasis mine, E 101-102/OA 38 147-148; translation Nadler 1995, p. 136).

Arnauld’s account, at least with respect to body→mind causal relations is occasionalist. God causes our mental states on the occasion of certain bodily states every time these bodily states occur.

As pointed out by Nadler, there is another work in which Arnauld does address mind→body causal relations, namely the Dissertation. In the Dissertation, Arnauld claims:

Our soul does not know what needs to be done to move our is properly only this reason…that can lead one to believe that it is not our soul that moves our arm. (OA 38 690/trans. Nadler 1995, pp. 138-139)

This is not an argument for occasionalism, as all Arnauld claims is that finite minds do not causally affect bodies. However, Arnauld has only three options open to explain the correspondence of mental states and physical states: finite minds, bodies or God. Bodies certainly do not have the capacity to recognize what to do on the occasion of states of the soul. Minds do not have the requisite knowledge to produce their own perceptions on the occasion of certain bodily states, so a fortiori, bodies would not have such a capacity (see Nadler 1995, p. 138). Thus, given that Arnauld denies that finite minds causally affect bodies, the only option available to explain the correspondence is God.

These passages illustrate Arnauld’s commitment to mind-body occasionalism. In fact, they illustrate that Arnauld’s mind-body occasionalism is an ad hoc response to some form of the problem of interaction (see Nadler 1995, pp. 142-143). Arnauld argues that it is clear that minds do not causally affect bodies and that bodies do not causally affect minds, so God must be responsible for the causal interaction.

Concerning body-body causation, Arnauld is less clear in his position. Nadler has suggested that Arnauld seems to allow body-body causal relations. Indeed, he cites the passage: “For the movement of a body can have at most no other real effect than to move another body” to suggest that Arnauld seems to hold that bodies do have causal power (Nadler 1995, p. 132). However, Arnauld follows this claim up with “I say at most, for possibly it cannot even do that.” There appears to be no text that establishes Arnaud’s view on the matter, but the hesitation in this passage may suggest that Arnauld was not completely satisfied with the possibility of body-body causal relations and at least would entertain the notion that body-body causal relations were occasionalist.

[Secondary literature: Ndiaye (1991); Watson (1987); Robinet (1991); Nadler (1995); Kremer (1996); Sleigh (1990).]

5. Conception of God and Theodicy

As noted in the introduction, Arnauld was primarily a theologian. Combining Arnauld’s focus on theological issues and his philosophical acumen, one might expect that Arnauld had especially interesting philosophical discussions and views pertaining to God, God’s modus operandi and theodicy. If so, one would not be disappointed. Two questions concerning Arnauld’s views on God are of particular importance. First, did Arnauld follow Descartes and endorse the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths. Second, what contributions, if any, did Arnauld make to the problem of theodicy and an account of God’s modus operandi.

a. The Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths



One of the most contested issues in Arnauld scholarship is whether Arnauld followed Descartes in endorsing the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths (henceforth: CET). Descartes first defends this position in a series of letters to Mersenne in 1630. For example, Descartes claims:

You ask me by what kind of causality God established the eternal truths. I reply: by the same kind of causality as he created all things, that is to say, as their efficient and total cause. For it is certain that he is the author of the essence of created things no less than their existence; and the essence is nothing other than the eternal truths…You ask what necessitated God to create these truths; and I reply that he was free to make it not true that all the radii of the circle are equal – just as free as he was not to create the world. And it is certain that these truths are no more necessarily attached to his essence than are other created things. You ask what God did in order to produce them. I reply that from all eternity he willed and understood them to be, and by that very fact he created them…In God, willing, understanding and creating are all the same thing without one being prior to the other even conceptually. (AT 1 152-153/CSMK III 25-26)

How to interpret CET is a difficult question in its own right. Eternal truths are truths like those of mathematics, for example, 2+2=4, and those about essences, for example, Descartes is a thinking thing. These sorts of truths are usually considered to be necessarily true. That is, they are considered to be truths that could not have been false. Yet, in this passage, Descartes seems to suggest that the eternal truths were created by God in such a way that they could have been false. There are many different interpretations of Descartes’ account of CET, three of which are especially worth noting. On one reading of CET, popularized by Frankfurt (1977), to claim that God freely created the eternal truths is to claim that all truths, even the eternal truths, are contingent. A second interpretation, popularized by Curley, holds that Descartes is not denying that the eternal truths are necessary, but rather that they are necessarily necessary (Curley 1984). Finally, a third interpretation, defended by Kaufman, holds that Descartes’ claim that God freely created the eternal truths is simply to claim that there were no factors, independent of God that compelled God to create the eternal truths as they were in fact created. Kaufman argues, however, that this is consistent with these truths being necessarily true (Kaufman 2002, p. 38). What is central to the doctrine on all three readings is that there is a legitimate sense in which God was free in creating the eternal truths and had the capacity to create them differently (or at least to not create them).

While Arnauld never explicitly addresses CET, whether he endorses it is the focus of much Arnauld scholarship. Interpretations vary from Andrew Robinet’s claim that “Arnauld offers a tranquil Cartesianism, which is not confused by the eternal truths” (Robinet 1991, p. 8), to Nadler’s suggestion that (depending on one’s interpretation of Descartes) Arnauld could be “seen as going further than Descartes, recognizing the truly radical potential of the Cartesian doctrine [CET] and embracing it” (Nadler 2008, p. 536), to Emmanuel Faye’s interpretation that “Arnauld’s doctrinal position” concerning the creation of the eternal truths “is not Cartesian but Thomist, even if it is, in actuality, a nuanced Thomism” (Faye 2005, p. 208), to Tad Schmaltz’s claim that “Arnauld never did take a stand on [the creation of the eternal truths]” (Schmaltz 2002, pp. 15-16).

Before discussing whether Arnauld adopted CET, three other views about God that Arnauld endorses should be addressed, namely the Principle of Divine Incomprehensibility (PDI), the Doctrine of Equivocity and the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity. All three of these views are held by Descartes (although they are not necessarily unique to Cartesianism, and attributing the Doctrine of Equivocity to Descartes is controversial). Further, all three views are relevant to Descartes’ acceptance of CET and to Arnauld’s account of God.

The Principle of Divine Incomprehensibility is the thesis that:

PDI:    (a) We ought to believe everything that is revealed by God.

(b) The fact that we cannot understand how something revealed by God can come about should not deter us from believing it because a finite intelligence ought not to expect to understand the nature or causal power of an infinite being. (Kremer 1996, p. 84)

In the Examen Arnauld directly endorses PDI:

Whatever God has been pleased to reveal to us about himself or about the extraordinary effects of his omnipotence ought to take first place in our belief even though we cannot conceive it, for it is not strange that our mind, being finite, cannot comprehend what an infinite power is capable of. (OA 38, 90/E 12/trans. Kremer 1996, p. 77)

In this passage Arnauld explicitly defends both components of PDI. We should believe everything revealed to us by God and we should believe it even if we cannot understand it because we ought not expect our finite intellect to be able to understand the infinite. In fact, Arnauld holds a view stronger than PDI, claiming that things God reveals to us ought to be placed first in our beliefs (see Kremer 1996, p. 88 fn. 5). Arnauld’s claim here is without doubt related to axiom A1 and his discussion of God and God’s omnipotence from section 3. Arnauld takes it that we know that God is omnipotent and that we should believe everything revealed to us by God even if we cannot understand how it can be true.

Arnauld also endorses the Doctrine of Equivocity or the thesis that predicates when applied to God and finite things have at most equivocal meanings and not at all univocal meanings. That is, to say that God is powerful and to say that Alexander the Great is powerful are to say entirely different things about God and Alexander the Great. In this context, “powerful” means something entirely different when applied to God and when applied to Alexander the Great. Properties that are possessed by God and by finite things, are at best equivocally similar properties. At the conclusion of a discussion about the Eucharist (see section 1b) and its relation to Cartesian philosophy in the Examen, Arnauld adds:

But I add before finishing…nothing would be more unreasonable than to hold that philosophers, who have the right to follow the light of reason in the human sciences, are required to take what is incomprehensible in the mystery of the Incarnation as a rule for their opinion when they attempt to explain the natural union of the soul with the body, as if the soul could do with regard to the body what the eternal Word could do with regard to the humanity he took on, even though the power, as will as the wisdom, of the eternal Word is infinite, while the power of the soul over the body to which it is joined is very limited. We would not have those thoughts which mix up everything in philosophy and theology, if we were more convinced of the clear and certain maxim that Cardinal Bellarmine used against the quibbles of the Socinians: “No inference can be made from the finite to the infinite,” or as others put it “there is no proportion [proportio] between the finite and the infinite”. (OA 38 175/E 141, trans. Carraud 1996, p. 9)

In this passage, Arnauld is defending the Doctrine of Equivocity. Arnauld cites as a “clear and certain maxim” that no inference can be made from the finite to the infinite, and considers it the same claim as there being “no proportion [proportio] between the finite and the infinite.” While attributing the Doctrine of Equivocity to Arnauld is controversial, to claim that there is no proportio (“proportion”, while most naturally translated “proportion” can also mean “analogy” or “symmetry”) between the finite and the infinite is at least prima facie to claim that properties of God and created things are in no way similar. [See, Nadler (2008), p. 533 and Carraud (1995), pp. 122-123 for a discussion of equivocity in Arnauld]. At the very least, Arnauld flatly denies the claim that predicates apply to God and creatures univocally. For properties to apply to God and creatures univocally is for those properties to be essentially the same kind of properties. Although God is infinite and creatures finite, according to the Doctrine of Univocity, what it is for God to have knowledge and for creatures to have knowledge is roughly the same (see Nadler 2008b, pp. 204-207 and Moreau 2000, p. 104).

Arnauld also endorses the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity, or the view that God is absolutely simple. For Arnauld, to claim that God is simple is, among other things, to deny any real distinction between God’s will, God’s understanding and God. God’s will and understanding are one and the same thing; God’s will just is God’s understanding. In addition, Arnauld’s version of divine simplicity is such that it is not the case that God’s will and understanding performing different functions in God’s action and creation. While the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity was ubiquitous among Arnauld’s contemporaries and predecessors, many seem to not require this latter claim as a component in divine simplicity. Arnauld's account of divine simplicity appears both in the correspondence with Leibniz and the debate with Malebranche. In the latter, for example, Arnauld offers this account of divine simplicity while arguing against Malebranche’s conception of God. In discussing God’s creation, Malebranche describes God as “consulting his wisdom.” In the Treatise Malebranche explains: “The wisdom of God reveals to him an infinity of ideas of different works, and all the possible ways of executing his plans” (OC 5 28/R116; for a nice summary of Malebranche’s theodicy, see Rutherford 2000). Thus, Malebranche has an account where God consults his understanding, considers the many different ways that he could create, and selects one.

Arnauld objects to this conception of God and God’s action in many ways. For example, Arnauld claims it is not appropriate to say that God: “’consults his wisdom’, and it is from there that it happens that all that He wills is wise.” For, Arnauld claims, God does not need to consult his wisdom in order to be wise, “everything that he wills” is “essentially wise as soon as he wills it” (OA 39 578/Nadler 2008, p. 531). Arnauld further claims that: “Can there be a thought more unworthy of God than to imagine such a disagreement between his wisdom and his will as if his will and his wisdom were not the same thing?” (OA 39 748/Moreau 2000, p. 103, trans. Nadler). In these passages, Arnauld is articulating his conception of God such that God’s different faculties do not play different roles in creation; God is absolutely simple. [See also Nelson (1993), pp. 685-688; Moreau (1999), especially pp. 280-286; Moreau (2000), especially section 4.3, pp. 102-104; and Nadler (2008), p. 533, for discussion of Arnauld and divine simplicity]

There is strong evidence that Arnauld endorsed the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity, Equivocity and PDI. In fact, it seems the text demands that Arnauld held divine simplicity and PDI and at least strongly supported the Doctrine of Equivocity. Returning to whether Arnauld also adopted the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths, the dominant view is that Arnauld denied CET (see for example Kremer 1996, Gouhier 1978, and Robinet 1991). Carraud (1996) and Schmaltz (2002) have argued either that Arnauld never made up his mind, or at least that the texts give us no answer. Faye argues that what is “created” about the eternal truths is not that they depend on the free decrees of God. Rather, the eternal truths are created on account of the fact that the truth is known by the human intellect, which is a created intellect (Faye 2005, pp. 206-207). Moreau (1999) has offered a very compelling case that Arnauld did in fact accept CET that is endorsed (and developed) by Nadler (2009). While this is too difficult a question to adequately answer here, what is clear is that Arnauld holds the same underlying conception of God (for example, strong notion of divine simplicity, Equivocity and PDI) that Descartes relies on in his exposition of and defense of CET and his conception of God at least approaches the Cartesian God (see Nadler 2009, p. 533). Arnauld explicitly claims in his account of PDI that we cannot understand the causal power of an infinite being and in his defense of Equivocity argues that finite beings and God have no proportion to another. Finally, in his account of divine simplicity, Arnauld denies that God understands conceptually prior to God’s willing certain states of affairs. Given PDI it seems that Arnauld would at least not positively claim that there are things that God cannot do (for example, make 2+3=6) and given Equivocity and divine simplicity it seems that Arnauld would not conceive of God creating in the way that Malebranche and Leibniz, for example, would hold, namely by understanding all the possible ways of creating conceptually prior to willing to create. In the Logic (see section 3), Arnauld denies that we can understand God’s omnipotence. Put all of these aspects of Arnauld’s conception of God together and it seems that Arnauld’s conception of God at least approaches CET.

b. Theodicy

Arnauld’s most systematic contributions to the question of theodicy come in his criticisms of Malebranche’s theodicy. As such, it will be beneficial to first briefly examine Malebranche’s theodicy before considering Arnauld’s response and account. Malebranche begins by citing two features of an infinitely perfect being: a wisdom that has no limits and a power that nothing is capable of resisting (R 116/OC V 27). Malebranche’s God surveys all of the possible universes that God could create and chooses to create the one that is the best reflection of God’s attributes. Malebranche claims:

An excellent workman should proportion his action to his work; he does not accomplish by quite complex means that which he can execute by simpler ones; he does not act without an end, and never makes useless efforts. From this one must conclude that God, discovering in the infinite treasure of his wisdom an infinity of possible worlds (as the necessary consequences of the laws of motion which he can establish), determines himself to create that world which could have been produced and preserved by the simplest laws, and ought to be the most perfect, with respect to the simplicity of the ways necessary to its production or to its conservation. (R/OC V 28)

The aim in God’s creation of the world is not to create the world with the least amount of evil, but the world that is the best reflection of God and God’s attributes. God, being infinitely wise, ought to create a world that is produced and preserved by the simplest laws. God acts, as Malebranche likes to say, nearly always by ‘general volitions’ and very rarely by ‘particular volitions’. When confronted with evil in the world, God did not will that that evil exist by a particular volition, but only as a consequence of the general laws that God has willed due to their simplicity, that is, by a general volition. Malebranche goes so far as to say that “God’s wisdom in a sense renders Him impotent; for since it obliges Him to act by the most simple ways, it is not possible for all humans to be saved” (OC 5 47, trans. Nadler 2008, p. 525).

Many things about Malebranche’s theodicy upset Arnauld. Only several of Arnauld’s more prominent objections shall be discussed here. First and foremost, Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because it limits God’s power. Arnauld was very adamant in his defense of divine power, so much so that he even criticizes Descartes, whose divine voluntarism is well-known, of limiting God’s power. In the New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations, Arnauld argues concerning Descartes’ claim that a vacuum is impossible: “I would rather acknowledge my ignorance than convince myself that God necessarily conserves all bodies, or at least that he cannot annihilate any one of them unless he at once creates another” (K 188/OA 38 75). Arnauld’s insistence on a strong conception of divine omnipotence continued throughout his career. He was critical of Malebranche’s theodicy because, he thought, it limits God’s power substantially. In the Reflexions, for example, Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s claim that God must choose the world with the simplest laws. In passages pointed out by Moreau (2000, p. 103), Arnauld claims of Malebranche’s theodicy and account of God’s action: “it is indeed strange that someone should so easily take the liberty to provide arbitrary boundaries to the freedom of God” and “He fears not to set limits to the freedom of God…He fears not to proclaim that…God will have no freedom in his choice of ways necessary for the execution of his designs…but on what basis could a doctrine so injurious to divine freedom be grounded?” (OA 39 603 and OA 39 594-595/both translations are Nadler’s and appear in Moreau 2000, p. 103). Overall, not only does this language undermine God’s omnipotence, but also humanizes his ways of acting. Arnauld claims: “All means for executing his designs are equally easy for God…and his power so renders him master of all things and so independent of the need for help from others, that it suffices that he will for his volitions to be executed” (OA 39 189-190/trans. Nadler 1996, p. 154, who points to this passage). Arnauld objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because he sees it as putting unnecessary and inappropriate constraints on God’s action and power

Arnauld also objects to Malebranche’s theodicy because Malebranche admits that evil exists in the world. According to Malebranche, there are legitimate evils in the world and these evils are allowed to exist by God. In fact, as noted above Malebranche is an occasionalist. Thus, it seems that God is causally responsible for evil. Arnauld, on the other hand, rejects this claim, insisting that apparent evils in the world are only appearances. Arnauld claims God’s work has no faults: “There are no faults in the works of God.” According to Arnauld, if we “consider the whole” world, or perhaps better, were we able to consider the whole, we would recognize that everything contributes to the overall beauty of the universe (OA 39 205/see also Nadler 1996, p. 156 who points to this passage).

Finally, Arnauld attacked Malebranche’s claim that God acts primarily by “general volitions” and very rarely by “particular volitions”. In a section of Malebranche’s Treatise added in a later addition to clarify the distinction (no doubt from Arnauld’s very objections), Malebranche defines what it means for God to act by a general volition and by a particular volition.

I say that God acts by general volitions, when he acts in consequence of general laws which he has established. For example, I say that God acts in me by general volitions when he makes me feel pain at the time I am pricked; because in consequence of the general and efficacious laws of the union of the soul and the body which he has established, he makes me feel pain when my body is ill-disposed. (R 195/OC V 147, I have replaced Riley’s “wills” with “volitions” for the French “volontez”)

He continues:

I say on the contrary that God acts by particular volitions when the efficacy of his volition is not determined at all by some general law to produce some effect. Thus, supposing that God makes me feel the pain of pinching without there happening in my body, or in any creature whatsoever, any changes which determine him to act in me according to general laws—I say then that God acts by particular volitions. (R 195/OC V 147-148, I have replaced “wills” and “will” with “volitions” and “volition”, respectively for the French “volontez” and “volonté”)


Arnauld argues that Malebranche’s claim that God acts almost always by general wills destroys God’s providential concern for creation. According to Arnauld, God acts according to general laws, but does not act by general laws (see, for example, OA 39 175).  Arnauld argues that in fact, God has a volition for every state of affairs in the world. Arnauld’s objection relies on interpreting Malebranche’s account of God’s acting by general volitions as one in which the contents of God general volitions are general laws. For example, on this reading the content of God’s volition might be “For all created substances x and y and for every time t1, if x is G at t1 and x bears relation R to y then there is a time t2 such that t2 bears relation T to t1 and y is F at t2” (this example is taken from Black 1997, p. 34). Thus on this reading, general volitions have contents which are laws. It is not clear that Arnauld interpreted Malebranche correctly in this regard. Indeed, a second plausible interpretation of Malebranche is that when Malebranche claims that God acts by general volitions, Malebranche means that God has particular content volitions in accordance with the natural laws (see Pessin 2001, for this very helpful way of explaining the distinction). So, Malebranche’s God would have a volitional content for every particular state of affairs of the world, but God’s volitional contents proceed according to general laws. If this latter reading is correct, then Arnauld’s objection seems to lack force as Malebranche does claim of God that God acts through general laws and not by general laws. What is clear is that Arnauld holds that God has a volitional content of every particular state of affairs of the world.

[For discussions of the correct interpretation of Malebranche in this respect see: Pessin (2001); Nadler (2000); Black (1997); and Stencil (2011)]

c. Arnauld’s God



If we combine the discussion of Arnauld’s commitments to his understanding of God from the two above discussions, we can see a distinction conception of God emerge. First and foremost, is Arnauld’s insistence that God (an infinite being) does not act in the way that created finite beings act. God’s understanding and will do not play different roles in creation or in God’s action. The necessity to consult one’s understanding before willing, having to balance different competing desires and not being able to achieve all of one’s ends is something that finite beings do, but not God. God is in this sense not a being with practical rationality (see for example, Nadler 2008, p. 518). Second, God created no evil (at least as a positive thing in the world). If we were capable of understanding creation in its entirety we would see that everything contributes to the greatness and beauty of the universe. And finally, from Arnauld’s objections to Malebranche’s theodicy, we can see that Arnauld holds that although God acts according to general laws, God does not act by general laws. God directly acts in every particular situation.

Before moving on, we are now finally in a position to consider Moreau’s suggestion as to why Arnauld begins his attack on Malebranche’s theodicy with an attack on Malebranche’s theory of ideas. From Arnauld’s perspective, Malebranche’s theory of ideas, especially his Vision in God doctrine and his theodicy are quite related. According to his Vision in God doctrine, created beings have ideas that are in a sense in God and Malebranche’s God acts much like created beings do, for example, by consulting his understanding. As Moreau (2000, pp. 104-106) argues, Arnauld sees both of these as an illegitimate understanding of God and endorsement of the Doctrine of Univocity. God has ideas that are in a sense accessible to us and acts in much the same way we do, according to Malebranche. These are both problematic for Arnauld, as he denies univocity between God and created beings. Indeed, if the above account is correct, he endorses equivocity.

6. Modality



In the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence, Arnauld not only offers many important objections to Leibniz’s view (some of which were outlined in section 1), but he also offers a positive account of modality. The best way to approach Arnauld's account is to consider one more of his objections to Leibniz.


Arnauld’s initial objection in his first letter revolves around Leibniz’s endorsement of the Complete Concept Theory of Substance (CCS). As Leibniz explains in the outline sent to Arnauld:


Since the individual concept of each person contains once for all everything that will ever happen to him, one sees in it a priori proofs or reasons for the truth of each event, or why one event has occurred rather than another. (M 5/G II 12)


Leibniz defends this view in the Discourse on Metaphysics:


We are able to say that this is the nature of an individual substance or of a complete being, namely, to afford a conception so complete that the concept shall be sufficient for the understanding of it and for the deduction of all the predicates of which the substance is or may become the subject. (D 13/G IV 349/AG 41)


CCS is the view that it is the nature of an individual substance to have a complete concept such that any true predication which can be made of that substance is contained in that substance’s concept. According to this view, not only is being a man contained in the concept of Caesar, but also that he crossed the Rubicon, that he was the subject of a biography by Plutarch and every other particular event in his life.

Arnauld adamantly objects to this principle:

If that is so, God was free to create or not create Adam; but supposing he wished to create him, everything that has happened since and will ever happen to the human race was and is obliged to happen through a more than fatal necessity. For the individual concept of Adam contained the consequence that he would have so many children, and the individual concept of each of these children, everything that they would do and all the children they would have: and so on. There is therefore no more liberty in God regarding all that, supposing he wished to create Adam, than in maintaining that God was free, supposing he wished to create me, not to create a nature capable of thought. (M 9/G II 15)

As with many of his objections to Malebranche, Arnauld is concerned that Leibniz’s view limits God’s power. Arnauld argues that once God has decided to create Adam, everything else that happens follows through necessity. This is because what is contained in Adam’s complete concept entails every other fact about the universe. For example, Adam’s complete concept entails not only that Caesar exist, but that Plutarch compose a treatise on Caesar. The reason is, or at least Arnauld seems to take it, that it is a true predication of Adam that Adam exists a certain number of years before Caesar. Since this is a true predication of Adam, and a complete concept of Adam (according to Leibniz) is sufficient to deduce all of Adam’s predicates; Caesar is either a part of Adam’s concept or straightaway follows from Adam’s concept. Arnauld finds this troubling. Not the least because he sees it as a threat to God’s omnipotence. Once God creates Adam, Arnauld claims, God is bound to create Caesar and everything else that God creates through a “more than fatal necessity.” Surely, Arnauld would claim, God could have created Adam and chosen not to create Caesar, or at least God could have created Caesar and Plutarch, but Plutarch wrote a biography on Aristotle instead. Arnauld treats this as an unacceptable limitation on God's power.

Leibniz responds, and among other things, offers his account of creation. Leibniz sums up the relevant part of his account of creation in the Monadology: “There is an infinity of possible universes in God’s ideas, and since only one of them can exist, there must be a sufficient reason for God’s choice which determines him towards one thing rather than another” (AG 220/G IV 615-616). Much like Malebranche, Leibniz considers that God’s creation takes place by God considering the possible ways that God could create. God’s decision to create is not piecemeal, as Leibniz claims: “one must not consider God’s will to create a particular Adam separate from all the others which he has regarding Adam’s children and the whole of the human race” (M 14/G IV 19). Leibniz continues that had God wanted to create a world with “Adam” and a different posterity, God would have created a different Adam with a different complete concept. Leibniz holds that God created in the best possible way from an infinite number of options. In these infinite different universes that God could create, there are many different “Adams” and in some of those worlds there are “Caesars” and in some there are not.

Ultimately, Arnauld concedes to Leibniz’s account of a complete concept, but the concession is only a terminological one. It turns out the real debate between the two is about the nature of possibility. As Arnauld tells Leibniz:

It was more than enough to make me decide to confess to you in good faith that I am satisfied by the way you explain what had at first shocked me regarding the concept of an individual nature…I see no other difficulties remaining except on the possibility of things, and this way of conceiving of God as having chosen the universe that he has created amongst an infinite number of other possible universes that he saw at the same time and did not wish to create. But as that strictly has no bearing upon the concept of the individual nature and since I should have to ponder too long to make clear what my views on the subject are, or rather what I take exception to in the ideas of others, because they do not seem to me to be worthy of God, you will think it advisable, Sir, that I say nothing about it. (M 77/G II 64)

As convincingly argued by Alan Nelson (1993), the debate between Leibniz and Arnauld is a debate between a possibilist (Leibniz) and an actualist (Arnauld). Possibilism is the view that there is an ontic distinction between two types of existing things: actual things and possible things. Actualism is the view that the only things that exist are actual things. According to Leibniz, prior to the creation of the universe, God considers all of the possible universe that God could create and chooses the best of those worlds and creates it. The world that God creates is the actual world. In addition to the actual world, there are an infinite number of merely possible worlds, which exist but only in God’s mind. In the above passage Arnauld offers his disagreement with this way of conceiving of God's creating: “I see no other difficulties remaining except on...this way of conceiving of God as having chosen the universe that he has created amongst an infinite number of other possible universes.” Nelson (1993, p. 686) has helpfully suggested keeping Arnauld's endorsement of the Doctrine of Divine Simplicity in mind in this passage. As argued in the section 5a, Arnauld held a view of divine simplicity such that God's different faculties do not play different roles in God's acting. Leibniz's God, given that he surveys his understanding prior (at least conceptually) to his willing to create, has faculties participating in God's action in different ways. This Arnauld sees as an unacceptable way to conceive of God and so there are no possible worlds in God’s mind that are not created.

After Arnauld objects to Leibniz’s account of creation and the existence of possible worlds in God’s understanding on account of its reliance on a view whereby God’s understanding and will are distinct (see M 27-33/G II 28-33), Arnauld then offers an actualist account:

I confess in good faith that I have no conception of these purely possible substances, that is to say, the ones that God will never create. And I am very much inclined to think that they are figments of the imagination that we create, and that what we call possible, purely possible, substances, cannot be anything other than God’s omnipotence, which being a pure act does not permit the existence in it of any possibility [et que tout ce que nous appelons substances possibles, purement possibles, ne peut être autre chose que la toute-puissance de Dieu, qui étant un pur acte ne souffre point qu’il y ait en lui aucune possibilité]. (M 31/G II 31-32)

Arnauld continues:

But one can conceive of possibilities in the natures which [God] has I can also do with an infinite number of modifications which are in the power of these created natures, such as the thoughts of intelligent natures and the forms of extended substance. (M 31-32/G I 32, see also Nelson 1993, p. 685 who points to this passage)

The view suggested by Arnauld is that all that exists are God and actual substances and all possibility exists in virtue of the modal properties or “powers” of actually existing substances. Prior to God’s creation, there are no ‘possible worlds’ in God’s understanding from which God chooses to create. Instead, God creates all actual things and possibility is grounded in these actual things and their powers. For example, Arnauld would claim, it is possible for Descartes to have written 7 meditations, instead of 6. This is not because God could have chosen to create a Descartes who wrote 7 meditations, but because it is in the power of the actually created Descartes that he could have written a 7th meditation.

7. Conclusion

Antoine Arnauld was a major figure in the intellectual landscape of the latter part of the 17th century. Although he has not received the attention that others have, for example, Descartes, Leibniz and Spinoza, Arnauld is finally starting to receive the attention he so rightly deserves from scholars. Arnauld was arguably the most philosophically gifted Cartesian of the latter part of the 17th century and explicitly defended Cartesianism even after Descartes’ works had been put on the index. His Objections to Descartes’ Meditations are arguably the best of any set. He went on to co-author an extremely influential logic text with Pierre Nicole. His correspondence with Leibniz, where he simultaneously pushes Leibniz to explain his position, offers insightful criticisms of Leibniz’s views and offers his own philosophical contributions is one of the most sophisticated and philosophically interesting texts of the period. And finally, Arnauld was a major player in one of the most important intellectual events of the 17th century, the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic that resulted in many works from both parties. There is much of interest in Arnauld that scholars are just beginning to investigate. While at least one major barrier to Arnauld’s acquiring more attention in the English-speaking world is the lack of English translation of many of his major texts, Arnauld scholarship will no doubt continue to become more prominent and Arnauld will finally receive the attention deserved of one of his influence and acumen.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Primary Texts
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1775) Oeuvres de Messire Antoine Arnauld, 43 vols., Paris: Sigismond D’Arnay, (abbreviated OA).
    • A collection of Arnauld’s works in their original language (Latin and French).
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1975) and Claude Lancelot, The Port Royal Grammar, Jacques Rieux and Bernard E. Rollin, trans., Paris: Mouton, (abbreviated PRG).
    • English translation of the Port-Royal Grammar.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1990) “New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations and Descartes’ Replies”, Elmar Kremer, trans, Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press, (abbreviated as NO).
    • English translation of the letters exchanged by Descartes and Arnauld in 1648.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1990b) On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, trans., Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press, (abbreviated as K)
    • English translation of On True and False Ideas.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1996) and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, Jill Vance Buroker, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, (abbreviated as B).
    • English translation of the Port-Royal Logic.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (1999) Examen du Traité de l’Essence du corps contre Descartes, Libraire Arthème Fayard, (abbreviated E).
    • A recent edition of the Examen. This edition is French (as was the original). No English translations of this work are available.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, (2001) Textes philosophiques, Denis Moreau, trans., Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, (abbreviated as TP).
    • Collection of some of Arnauld’s works including: Philosophical Conclusions (in the original Latin with French translation, no English translation available); excerpt of Quod est nomen Dei (in original Latin with French translation, no English translation available); Dissertation en Deux Parties (French translation from the Latin, Latin not included, no English translation available); and Règles du Bon Sens (French, no English translation available).
  • Descartes, Rene, (1974-1989) Oeuvres de Descartes, 11 vols., Charles Adam and Pual Tannery, eds., Paris: Vrin, (abbreviated as AT)
    • Descartes’ collected works in their original language (French and Latin).
  • Descartes, Rene, (1984-1985) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 2 vols., John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugland Murdoch, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, (abbreviated as CSM I, and CSM II).
    • Two-volume collection, with standard English translation of many of Descartes’ works.
  • Descartes, Rene, (1991) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes: Volume III, John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugland Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny trans, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, (abbreviated as CSMK III).
    • Third volume and companion to CSM I and II. This volume is a collection of many of Descartes’ letters.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried, (1875-1890) Die Philosophischen Schriften von G. W. Leibniz, ed. C.I. Gerhardt, 7 vols (Berlin, Weidman), (abbreviated as G).
    • A collection of Leibniz’s complete works in their original language (Latin, French and German).
  • Leibniz, Gottfried, (1967) The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, trans. H. T. Mason, (Manchester: Manchester University Press). (abbreviated as M)
    • English translation of the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried, (1980) Discourse on Metaphysics/Correspondence with Arnauld/Monadology, trans. George Montgomery, La Salle: The Open Court Publishing Company, (abbreviated as D).
    • English translation of Leibniz’s Discourse on Metaphysics, Monadology and the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence. More readily available than the Mason translation.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried, (1989) Philosophical Essays, eds. and trans. Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber, Indianapolis: Hackett, (abbreviated as AG).
    • One volume collection of many of Leibniz’s most important works in English.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, (1958-1967) Oeuvres Complètes de Malebranche, Directeur A. Robinet, 20 volumes (Paris: J. Vrin), abbreviated OC. Citation as follows: (OC, volume, page).
    • Malebranche’s collected works in their original language (French).
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, (1992) Philosophical Selections, ed. Nadler, Indianapolis: Hackett, (abbreviated as PS).
    • Collection of Malebranche selections in English.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, (1992) Treatise on Nature and Grace, trans. Patrick Riley, Oxford: Clarendon Press, (abbreviated as R).
    • English translation of Malebranche’s Treatise on Nature and Grace.
  • Voltaire, (1906) Siècle de Louis XIV (Paris: Hachette)
    • Voltaire’s history of the Age of Louis XIV.
  • Primary Source Abbreviations
  • Antoine Arnauld
  • B         (1996) and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, Jill Vance Buroker, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • E          (1999) Examen du Traité de l’Essence du corps contre Descartes, Libraire Arthème Fayard.
  • K         (1990b) On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, trans., Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press.
  • NO      (1990) “New Objections to Descartes’ Meditations and Descartes’ Replies”, Elmar Kremer, trans, Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press.
  • OA      (1775-1783) Oeuvres de Messire Antoine Arnauld, 43 vols., Paris: Sigismond D’Arnay.
  • PRG    (1975) and Claude Lancelot, The Port Royal Grammar, Jacques Rieux and Bernard E. Rollin, trans., Paris: Mouton.
  • TP        (2001) Textes philosophiques, Denis Moreau, trans., Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Rene Descartes
  • AT       (1974-1989) Oeuvres de Descartes, 11 vols., Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, eds., Paris: Vrin.
  • CSM I (1984-1985) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 2 vols., John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugland Murdoch, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • CSMK III (1991) The Philosophical Writings of Descartes: Volume III, John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugland Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny trans, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gottfried Leibniz
  • AG      (1989) Philosophical Essays, eds. and trans. Roger Areiw and Dnaiel Garber, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • D         (1980) Discourse on Metaphysics/Correspondence with Arnauld/Monadology, George Montgomery trans, La Salle: The Open Court Publishing Company.
  • G         (1875-1890) Die Philosophiscehm Schriften von G. W. Leibniz, ed. C.I. Gerhardt, 7 vols (Berlin, Weidman).
  • M         (1967) The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, trans. H. T. Mason, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
  • Nicolas Malebranche
  • OC      (1958-1967) Oeuvres Complètes de Malebranche, Directeur A. Robinet, 20 volumes (Paris: J. Vrin).
  • PS        (1992) Philosophical Selections, ed. Nadler, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • R         (1992) Treatise on Nature and Grace, trans. Patrick Riley, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Secondary Works
  • Article Collections on Arnauld in English:
  • The Great Arnauld and Some of His Philosophical Correspondents ed. Elmar Kremer (Toronto: Toronto University Press, 1990).
    • Contains two papers on Arnauld’s logic and scientific method authored by Jill Vance Buroker and Fred Wilson respectively, five papers on Arnauld and Malebranche on ideas by Monte Cook, Elmar Kremer, Steven Nadler, Richard Watson and Norman Wells respectively, two papers on the Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, by Graeme Hunter and Jean-Claude Pariente respectively and one paper on Arnauld’s account of grace and free will, by Kremer.
  • Interpreting Arnauld, ed. Elmar Kremer (Toronto: Toronto University Press, 1996).
    • Collection of papers on Arnauld including papers by Jill Vance Buroker, Alan Nelson, Peter Schouls, Thomas Lennon, Aloyse-Raymond Ndiaye, Elmar Kremer, Vincent Carraud, Graeme Hunter, Jean-Luc Solère, Steven Nadler, and Robert C. Sleigh, some of which will be highlighted in the bibliography below.
  • Books/Articles:
  • Black, Andrew, (1997) “Malebranche’s Theodicy”, Journal of the History of Philosophy 35, pp. 27-44.
    • Discussion of Malebranche’s theodicy, containing a defense of the ‘general content’ reading of the particular-general volitions distinction in Malebranche.
  • Buroker, Jill Vance, (1996) “Introduction” in Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, Jill Vance Buroker, trans., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. ix-xxvi.
    • Helpful introduction to the Logic.
  • Carraud, Vincent, (1995) “Arnauld: From Ockhamism to Cartesianism” Descartes and His Contemporaries, in Ariew and Grene, ed., Descartes and His Contemporaries, pp. 110-128.
    • An examination of Arnauld’s early philosophy (pre-Fourth Objections) arguing that Arnauld’s early philosophy is in many respects Ockhamist.
  • Carraud, Vincent, (1996) “Arnauld: A Cartesian Theologian? Omnipotence, Freedom of Indifference, and the Creation of the Eternal Truths”, in Kremer, ed., Interpreting Arnauld, pp. 91-110.
    • A discussion of whether Arnauld held the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths.
  • Curley, E.M., (1984) “Descartes on the Creation of the Eternal Truths”, The Philosophical Review 93,  pp. 569-597.
    • Paper focusing on Descartes and the eternal truths. Standard defense of the iterated modality reading.
  • Faye, Emmanuel, (2005) “The Cartesianism of Desgabets and Arnauld and the Problem of the Eternal Truths”, Garber, Daniel and Steven Nadler, eds., Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy vol. 2 (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 191-209.
    • Discussion of the Cartesianism of Arnauld (especially on the Creation of the Eternal Truths) and Robert Desgabets.
  • Frankfurt, Harry, (1977) “Descartes on the Creation of the Eternal Truths”, The Philosophical Review 86, pp. 36-57.
    • Paper focusing on Descartes and the eternal truths. Standard defense of the contingency reading.
  • Gouhier, Henri, (1978) Cartesianisme et augustinisme au XVII siècle, Paris: J Vrin.
    • Book-length study of Augustinianism and Cartesianism in the 17th century with discussion of many figures from the period including two chapters largely on Arnauld. In French.
  • Grene, Marjorie, (1998) Descartes, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company.
    • Book on Descartes’ general philosophy with a chapter on ‘The Port Royal Connection’ with much discussion of Arnauld.
  • Jacques, Emile, (1976) Les anées d’exil d’Antoine Arnauld (1679-1694) (Louvain: Publications Universitaires de Louvain and Editions Nauwelaerts).
    • Historical study of Arnauld especially from 1679-1694. In French.
  • Kaufman, Dan, (2002) “Descartes’s Creation Doctrine and Modality”, Australasion Journal of Philosophy 80, pp. 24-41.
    • Paper focusing on Descartes and the eternal truths. Defends the claim that Descartes held both the God freely created the eternal truths and that they are necessarily true.
  • Kremer, Elmar J., (1990) “Introduction”, On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, trans., (Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press), pp. xi-xxxiv.
    • Helpful introduction to On True and False Ideas including a discussion of the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic.
  • Kremer, Elmar J., (1994) “Grace and Free Will in Arnauld”, in The Great Arnauld and Some of His Philosophical Correspondents, pp. 219-239.
    • A discussion of grace and freewill in Arnauld arguing for a change in his view around 1684.
  • Kremer, Elmar J., (1996) “Arnauld’s Interpretation of Descartes as a Christian Philosopher”, in Interpreting Arnauld, pp. 76-90.
    • A discussion of several issues in which Kremer argues Arnauld departs from Descartes including on the nature of matter, the relation between mind and body and the eternal truths.
  • Lennon, Thomas M., (1977) “Jansenism and the Crise Pyrrhonienne”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 38, pp. 297-306.
    • Discussion of the relationship between Jansenism and skepticism, arguing that skepticism was characteristic of Jansenism.
  • Miel, Jan, (1969) “Pascal, Port-Royal, and Cartesian Linguistics”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 30, pp. 261-271.
    • Article questioning the extent to which the Port-Royal Logic and the Port-Royal Grammar are ‘Cartesian’.
  • Moreau, Denis, (1999) Deux Cartesiens: La Polemique Arnauld Malebranche, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    • Book-length study of the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic. No English translation is available. There is an English version of a paper summarizing some of the key aspects of the debate by the same author. See, Moreau (2000).
  • Moreau, Denis, (2000) “The Malebranche-Arnauld Debate”, in ed. Nadler, The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche, pp. 87-111.
    • Article-length summary of some of the main components of the Arnauld-Malebranche polemic. Including a helpful chronology of the writtings in the debate.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1988) “Arnauld, Descartes, and Transubstantiation: Reconciling Cartesian Metaphysics and Real Presence”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 49, pp. 229-246.
    • Examination of the role that the problem of transubstantiation played in Arnauld’s philosophy (both his ultimate endorsement of Cartesianism and his defense ofCartesianism).
  • Nadler, Steven, (1988b) “Cartesianism and the Port Royal”, Monist, 71, pp. 573-584.
    • Study of the relation between the Port Royal and Cartesianism especially focusing on three figures: Louis-Paul Du Vaucel, Le Maistre de Sacy and Pierre Nicole.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1989) Arnauld and the Cartesian Philosophy of Ideas, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • Book-length discussion of Arnauld's theory of ideas, especially in terms of the Malebranche-Arnauld polemic.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1992) Malebranche and Ideas (New York: Oxford University Press)
    • Book-length study of Malebranche’s theory of ideas.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1995) “Occasionalism and the Question of Arnauld’s Cartesianism”, in Ariew and Grene, ed., Descartes and His Contemporaries, pp. 129-144.
    • Paper arguing that Arnauld was a mind-body occasionalist.
  • Nadler, Steven, (1996) “’Tange montes et fumigabunt’: Arnauld on the Theodicies of Malebranche and Leibniz”, in Kremer, ed. Interpreting Arnauld, pp. 147-163.
    • An examination of Arnauld’s criticisms of the theodicies of Leibniz and Malebranche arguing that from Arnauld’s perspective, despite their differences both suffer the same problems.
  • Nadler, Steven, ed., (2000b) The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche, New York: Cambridge University Press.
    • Collection of papers on Malebranche including papers on the Malebranche-Arnauld Debate, Malebranche’s Theodicy and Vision in God.
  • Nadler, Steven, (2008) “Arnauld’s God” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 46 (2008), pp. 517-538.
    • Paper-length treatment of Arnauld’s conception of God arguing that Arnauld had a thoroughly voluntarist conception of God.
  • Nadler, Steven, (2008b) The Best of All Possible Worlds, Farrar, Straus and Giroux: New York.
    • Book-length (and especially accessible) discussion of the theodicies and interactions of Leibniz, Arnauld and Malebranche.
  • Ndiaye, Aloyse-Raymond, (1991) La Philosophie D’Antoine Arnauld, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    • Book-length general study of Arnauld’s philosophy. In French.
  • Ndiaye, Aloyse-Raymond, (1996) “The Status of the Eternal Truths in the Philosophy of Antoine Arnauld”, in Kremer, ed. Interpreting Arnauld, pp. 64-75.
    • Paper-length argument that Arnauld (at least early in his career) did not endorse the Doctrine of the Creation of the Eternal Truths.
  • Nelson, Alan, (1993) "Cartesian Actualism in the Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence", Canadian Journal of Philosophy 23, pp. 675-94.
    • Paper arguing that Arnauld endorsed an actualist theory of possibility in the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence.
  • Parkinson, G. H. R., (1967) “Introduction”, in The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, trans. H. T. Mason, (Manchester: Manchester University Press).
    • Relatively brief (about 50 pages) summary and analysis of the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence.
  • Pessin, Andrew, (2001) “Malebranche’s Distinction Between General and Particular Volitions”, Journal of the History of Philosophy 39, pp. 77-99.
    • Defense of the ‘particular content’ interpretation of Malebranche’s distinction between general and particular volitions.
  • Robinet, Andre, (1991) Preface, in Ndiaye (1991), Prais: J Vrin.
    • Brief preface to Ndiaye's Antoine Arnauld.
  • Rozemond, Marleen, (1998) Descartes’s Dualism, Cambridge Mass.: Harvard University Press.
    • Book-length study of Descartes’ dualism including discussion of the Real Distinction argument and the mind-body union.
  • Rutherford, Donald, (2000) “Malebranche’s Theodicy”, in Steven Nadler ed., The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche (New York: Cambridge University Press), pp. 165-189.
    • Excellent overview of Malebranche’s theodicy.
  • Schmaltz, Tad, (1996) Malebranche’s Theory of the Soul, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Book-length treatment of Malebranche’s theory of the soul and its relation to his Cartesianism. Includes many discussions of Arnauld and his interactions with Malebranche.
  • Schmaltz, Tad, (1999) “What Has Cartesianism to Do with Jansenism?”, Journal of the History of Philosophy, 60, pp. 37-56.
    • This paper explores the relationship between Cartesianism and Jansenism. This paper discusses both their theoretical relation as well as their historical relation in 17th century France.
  • Schmaltz, Tad, (2002) Radical Cartesianism, New York: Cambridge University Press.
    • Book-length investigation of the philosophy of two Seventeenth Century Cartesians: Robert Desgabets and Pierre-Sylvain Regis, with substantive discussions of Arnauld throughout.
  • Sedgwick, Alexander, (1977) Jansenism in Seventeenth-Century France, Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia.
    • Book-length study of Jansenism in 17th century France.
  • Sedgwick, Alexander, (1998) The Travails of Conscience, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • Book-length historical study of the Arnauld family.
  • Sleigh, Robert C, (1990) Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on Their Correspondence, New Haven: Yale University Press.
    • A book-length treatment of the Leibniz-Arnauld correspondence including a chapter devoted to Arnauld, and chapters focusing on the exchange between Leibniz and Arnauld on substance, freedom and action,
  • Stencil, Eric, (2011) “Malebranche and the General Will of God”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy 19 (6), pp. 1107-1129.
    • Discussion of Malebranche’s conception of the general/particular volition distinction and argument focusing on Malebranche’s theodicy that Arnauld misunderstood the distinction.
  • Van Cleve, James, (1983) “Conceivability and the Cartesian Argument for Dualism”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 64, pp. 35-45.
    • Paper focusing on Descartes’ argument for mind-body substance dualism.
  • Watson, Richard A., (1987) The Breakdown of Cartesian Metaphysics, Atlantic Heights: Humanities Press.
    • Book-length discussion of the “downfall” (both historically and philosophically) of Cartesian Metaphysics covering many debates about Cartesianism after Descartes including discussions of Simon Foucher, Louis de La Forge and Arnauld.
  • Wilson, Margaret, (1978) Descartes (London and New York: Routledge).
    • Book-length general (and very influential) study of Descartes’ philosophy.
  • Yablo, Stephen, (1993) “Is Conceivability a Guide to Possibility?”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 53, pp. 1-42.
    • An examination of several objections to the claim that conceivability is a guide to possibility


Author Information

Eric Stencil
Utah Valley University
U. S. A.

Ralph Cudworth (1617—1688)

CudworthRalph Cudworth was an English philosopher and theologian, representative of a seventeenth century movement known as the Cambridge Platonists.  These were the first English philosophers to publish primarily in their native tongue, and to use Plato as a core influence.  Three of Cudworth’s works: The True Intellectual System of the Universe, A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality, and A Treatise on Freewill together constitute the most complete available exposition of the Platonist world-view.

The Platonist School formed as a response to the intellectual crisis following the Calvinist victory in the English Civil Wars.  The Calvinists believed that human intellect was useless for understanding God’s will.  Only revelation was acceptable. With the death of Charles I, and the failure of traditional authority, several factions of Calvinism sought to define the new order that would replace the old order according to their own revelations. Without any mediating authority, or grounds to negotiate compromise, violence was often the result.

The Platonists constructed a natural theology supporting the concept of free will, and opposing the materialism of Thomas Hobbes. To its members, there was no natural divide between philosophy and theology.  Reason could, therefore, sort out rival theological and ethical claims without the violence that had troubled their generation.

To support this agenda, Cudworth devoted himself to developing a model of the universe, based on a vast body of both ancient and contemporary sources.  His ontology was based upon Neoplatonism, and involved a World-Soul he called “Plastic Nature.”  His epistemology was an amended Platonism, where the “Essences” that served as the standards of rationality, ordering both the mind and the universe, were innate to God.  In order to support the concept that people have free will, he developed a modern-sounding psychology derived from Epictetus’s Stoic psychology.  With this theory he attacked the concepts of materialism, voluntarism, and determinism.

The Cambridge School was primarily a reactionary assembly, and they largely dissolved when the Restoration of the Monarchy provided a political resolution to their generation’s concerns.  However, Cudworth exerted a subtle influence on later generations.  Through his daughter Damaris, his ideas helped to shape the philosophies of John Locke and Gottfried Leibniz, among others.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Publications
    1. Sermons
    2. The True Intellectual System of the Universe
    3. Posthumous works
  3. The Cambridge Platonists
    1. Calvinist Doctrines
    2. Platonist Responses
    3. Sources and Influences
  4. Themes in Cudworth’s Work
    1. The Essences and Rational Theology
    2. Ontology
      1. The Necessity of Dualism
      2. Atomic Materialism
      3. “Stratonical” Materialism
      4. Plastic Nature
    3. Epistemology
      1. Knowledge as Propositional
      2. The Essences in Epistemology
      3. Plastic Nature in Epistemology
      4. The Failings of Plastic Nature in Epistemology
    4. Free Will
      1. The Hegemonikon
      2. God’s Choice
      3. Human Choice
  5. Cudworth’s Influence
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography


Ralph Cudworth was born in Aller, Somerset, in 1617.  His father was Ralph Cudworth, the Rector of Aller, a Fellow of Emmanuel College, Cambridge, and a former chaplain to King James I.  His mother, Mary Machell Cudworth, had been a nurse for James’s elder son, Henry.  Cudworth Senior died in 1624, and Mary Cudworth then married Doctor John Stoughton who replaced him as Rector of Aller.  Stoughton also saw to young Ralph’s home schooling.

In 1632, Cudworth enrolled in Emmanuel.  He received a Bachelor of Arts in 1635 and a Masters of Arts in 1639.  He was also elected a Fellow of Emmanuel, at this time, and began to serve as a tutor.  Cudworth earned a Bachelors of Divinity in 1646 and a Doctorate in Divinity in 1651.  During this time, he also became a friend of Benjamin Whichcote, the founder of the philosophical and theological movement known as The Cambridge Platonists.

During the English Civil Wars, Cudworth’s sympathies were with Parliament.  In 1644, representatives of Parliament appointed Cudworth to serve as the Master of Clair Hall, replacing a monarchist who had been ejected from that post.  In the next year, he was named Regius Professor in Hebrew.  From 1650 to 1654, he also served as the rector of North Cadbury, Somerset, which operated under the authority of Emmanuel College.  In 1654, Cudworth left both Clair Hall and the rectory to become the master of Christ’s College, Cambridge.

Judged a political moderate, Cudworth retained his position at Christ’s College upon the restoration of the monarchy, in 1660.  Sheldon, the Bishop of London, named him the Vicar of Ashwell, Hetford in 1662.  He was also given the Prebendry of Gloucester in 1678.   He died on June 26, 1688, at Cambridge, and was buried in the chapel at Christ’s College.

After becoming master of Christ’s College, Cudworth married Damaris Craddock Andrews.  They had two sons, John, and Charles, and one daughter, Damaris.  John and Charles Cudworth both died before their father.  Damaris Cudworth survived, and would anonymously author two philosophic works of her own: A Discourse Concerning the Love of God, and Occasional Thoughts. She also wrote the first biography of John Locke, with whom she was a close friend and correspondent.  She also wrote to Gottfried Leibniz, with whom she debated the merits of both her father’s works, and of Locke’s.

2. Publications

a. Sermons

Cudworth’s publications include theological texts such as A Discourse Concerning the True Notion of the Lords Supper (1642), and The Union of Christ and the Church, (1642).  He also published various sermons, including A Sermon before the House of Commons (1647).  As with most Platonists a good deal of his philosophical theories are expressed through published transcriptions of their sermons. This made them the first philosophers to express their theories primarily in English.  Cudworth would also write more conventional philosophical arguments to support their program.

b. The True Intellectual System of the Universe

His philosophical work is dominated by The True Intellectual System of the Universe: the First Part wherein All the Reason and Philosophy of Atheism is Confuted and Its Impossibility Demonstrated (1678). The System was supposed to be an exhaustive, three-part presentation of his entire Platonist world-view.  In his first volume he would attack atheism, most particularly as interpreted by Hobbes.  Thus, this work would also be arguing against Materialism.  The second volume would attack Voluntarism, as was accepted by John Calvin.  In the third, he would directly argue against the fatalism accepted by both Calvin and Hobbes.

However, the first volume of the System became controversial upon publication.  Some saw a crypto-atheism in Cudworth’s didactic style.  He first stipulated what he saw as all of the arguments for materialism and atheism, and then, after outlining his general philosophic positions, showed how that system answered all of these arguments.  Many found his initial arguments more compelling than his later responses.  This led some to wonder if this was not the intent.  Others disputed interpretations of Christian doctrine expressed in the System.  In response to these problems, Cudworth chose to suspend the project.

c. Posthumous works

Cudworth’s posthumous publications include A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality (1731), and A Treatise on Freewill (1838). These are based upon surviving manuscripts of the projected continuation of the True System. In 1733, his True Intellectual System was translated to Latin and published in France by J. L. von Mosheim as Systema intellectuale hujus Universi, seu de veris Naturae originibus, correcting several Greek translations in the original, and introducing the work to a Continental audience.

3. The Cambridge Platonists

Cudworth was nominally a Calvinist, but he was not orthodox.  As a member of the Platonist movement, he rejected significant elements of the Calvinist theology.

a. Calvinist Doctrines

Orthodox Calvinists are voluntarists.  To them, God is primarily omnipotent, and nothing, not even logic, can restrain Him.  If He chose to make a man a married bachelor, for example, that would be easily within His power.  This meant that all of His activities are merely to be the absurd assertions of the universe’s unique existentialist subject.

As a consequence, Calvinists are also Enthusiasts, to whom all theological knowledge came to man through divine revelation.  Man’s rational powers, bound to logic, are simply useless with reference to God.  Believing that theology is the only acceptable grounding for ethics, this implies, to Calvinists that ethical standards are similarly dependent on divine fiat and revelation.

In addition, Calvinists were Fatalists, rejecting the concept of human free will.  If free will existed, they would argue, an individual would have more power over their own actions than had God.  This would compromise God’s absolute power.  Human actions would also be contingent, and thus, unpredictable.  This would compromise His omniscience.  Neither compromise was acceptable to the Calvinists, so they restricted all agency to the omnipotence of the Supreme Being.

Finally, Calvinism taught that, as a result of Original Sin, man’s nature was totally depraved, and irremediable through human efforts.  Unable to control his fate, man was wholly dependent on God for his moral status.  Neither his reason, nor his will could improve his character.

b. Platonist Responses

The Cambridge Platonists unanimously rejected all of these positions. Cudworth called them “the theory of the arbitrary deity.”(Ralph Cudworth, The True Intellectual System of the Universe, II.529.)  Their goal was to vindicate the power of the human intellect, and human moral responsibility.  To do otherwise, in their eyes, rendered any conception of God’s wisdom and goodness meaningless.

Instead, they supported a natural theology which could prove the existence of God, and the superiority of Christianity.  Beyond these basic points, disputes between individuals with different beliefs could and should be settled with debate, when this was possible.  When this method failed to produce a definitive resolution, they argued, differences between belief systems should be tolerated in the spirit of humility.  If humanity really needed to understand something, God, as a rational and benevolent entity, would allow it the information required to develop an understanding.  Thus, all people who make an honest effort to understand God, should and, in fact, did, come up with the same basic theological positions.  Education and rational persuasion are the only methods required to correct differences that exist between good people on fundamental matters.  Because man’s theological and ethical deliberations were capable of yielding some results, he must be, at least to the limited extent that his finite reasoning faculty allows, capable of taking some remedial steps towards his own salvation.

This position is formally known as “Latitudinarianism.” It would dominate Cudworth’s writings and sermons, beginning with A Sermon before the House of Commons.  The largest segment of the True System amounts to an attempted historical demonstration of Latitudinarianism.  There, he seeks to prove that all great thinkers in history were believers in God who agreed on the basic points of Christian doctrine.  He conducts an encyclopedic review of the history of philosophy, as he knew it, to garner support for this point.

Unfortunately, these historical digressions are more efforts at myth-making than legitimate arguments.  In order to demonstrate the reasonableness of Christianity, the author rewrites philosophic history to show that as many ancient philosophers as possible were, in some sense, Christian.  He also expands the borders of Christian doctrine so as to accommodate as many diverse philosophies as possible within it.  Both philosophy and Christian doctrine suffer some violence in this process.  As a result, after the System’s publication, several readers accused Cudworth of some form heresy, generally Tritheism, or Arianism.

c. Sources and Influences

The Cambridge Platonists’ primary intellectual resource was, obviously, Plato.  The Cambridge Platonists would be the first English philosophers to use him so prominently in their works.  However, their understanding of Plato was mediated by St. Augustine’s Neoplatonism.  Thus, they tended to confuse Plato’s beliefs with that of Plotinus.  Aristotle and the Stoics were also among their major influences.

Platonists also felt the influence of their contemporaries.  They particularly appreciated the rationalism of both Hobbes and René Descartes.  But, Descartes was a voluntarist.  At the same time, his theory of innate ideas seemed, to the Platonists, to lead to psychological determinism analogous to his mechanistic conception of material actions.  This paradoxically left it with what Cudworth called a “tang of the atheistic mechanistic humour.”(True System, I.283)  On the other hand, Hobbes’s rationalism led him to determinism, materialism, moral relativism, and, it seemed, atheism.  The Platonists could not accept either option.

Cudworth, in particular, was very historically-minded.  He tried to incorporate as many historic philosophers as possible into his arguments.  He seems to have believed that all of his contemporaries’ philosophical positions were passed down from some ancient thinker.  This skewed his understanding of contemporary thinkers, such as Thomas Hobbes, who seemed, to Cudworth, nothing more than a contemporary follower of Democritus.

4. Themes in Cudworth’s Work

a. The Essences and Rational Theology

To Cudworth, in a universe where God’s omnipotence trumped His omniscience, there would be no final truths for Him to know. “Truth and falsehood would be only names.  Neither would there be any more certainty in the knowledge of God, himself.” (True System, III. 539)  So, he concluded, if God is omniscient, as Christian doctrine dictates, then there must be eternal truths to know, which are invulnerable to His power.

To be eternal, at least in the sense intended in Platonic Theism that Cudworth espouses, these truths would have to be self-justifying, logically necessary principles, and not mere conditional facts.  Cudworth called them the “Essences.”  They are his equivalent of Plato’s Forms.  To Cudworth, such eternal principles “do not exist without us…but in the mind, itself.”(True System, III. 622)  Human minds cannot directly bear such entities, because they, themselves, are not eternal: “of that which is in constant change nothing may be affirmed as constantly true.”(True System, III. 627; quoting Aristotle, Metaphysics, 4.5)  The principles must exist within a mind that is also eternal.  The only such mind is God’s.  And so, Cudworth concludes, logically necessary principles exist as natural configurations of God’s mind.  They do not exist above Him, but as a self-disciplining element of His divine psychology.

With God’s mind disciplined by the logic of the Essences, He and His works must always be rational.  This means that, to the extent allowed by finite human capacities, rational deliberation can, with confidence, develop sound opinions concerning God, and His works.  Revelation, although possible, in such a theory, is not necessary for theological or ethical judgments.  Moreover, revealed theological truths must be reasonable, so disputes between revelations may be solved through sufficient rational analysis.  If man cannot resolve such a dispute, it must be because his rational powers are insufficient to the task, and so, his proper attitude towards the issue should be one of humility, not violent intolerance.

Cudworth also uses these Essences as a Design Argument for the existence of God.  If the human mind can understand the universe, at least to some extent, through reason, he contends, then necessary logical principles must guide the universe.  But necessary logical principles must be eternal truths.  Eternal truths that can only exist contained within an eternal mind.  This mind, by virtue of such containment, would know, and direct, the universe.  Thus, because man can use reason to gain knowledge of the universe, there is a rational God.

b. Ontology

i. The Necessity of Dualism

Cudworth’s Ontology is the primary focus of The True System. He begins it by gathering all of the various forms of atheism and reduces them to two general types, each founded on a different form of materialism.  The first is atomism.  It holds that matter consists of individual particles, each of which is incapable of initiating motion its own.  Cudworth calls the other “Stratonical” materialism, after Strato Lampsacus, the third director of the Lyceum.  It allows matter to initiate action, claiming that the universe is a single, self-organizing, but non-conscious entity.  In keeping with his Latitudinarian beliefs, Cudworth is willing to adopt each of these theories, up to a point.

But, Cudworth defines matter as being necessarily non-conscious.  As the universe is active, and the logical order of the universe implies, to Cudworth, the existence of an eternal logical mind, it seems obvious that matter cannot account for the entire universe.  Cudworth address, and rejects, the possibility that consciousness comes into existence as an emergent property.  Citing the Neoplatonic doctrine that “an effect cannot be superior to its cause”(True System, III.81) and the logical principle that “nothing comes from nothing,”(True System, II.67) he argues that it is clearly absurd and paradoxical that such things come from a substance that does not itself demonstrate any potential for either property.  Therefore, either line of thought goes astray when it leads to materialism and atheism.

ii. Atomic Materialism

Cudworth supports the conception that matter is made of atomic particles, but holds that this belief and atheism are fundamentally incompatible.  To him, matter is an essentially passive entity.  Therefore, the atomic motion which accounts for all mechanical action is as a reaction to an outside stimulus.  But this stimulus cannot be material, or else we are left with a vicious cycle.  Following Thomas Aquinas’s Cosmological Argument, this cycle can only be broken by having in an unmoved mover operating somewhere in the causal history of an event.  Only God has such a resume.  And so, Cudworth concludes, atomists must not be materialists.  They must be dualists who believe in an eternal God, if they are to be logically consistent.

Having established this, to his satisfaction, Cudworth turns to myth-making.  He advances a history of atomic theory that he shared with his friend, fellow Cambridge Platonist, Henry More.  Democritus, he claims, was not the first atomist, but merely the first atheistic atomist.  Atomism was, in fact, taught by Moses, and was brought to Greece by Pythagoras.  From him, it was supposedly passed down to Plato, Aristotle, Plutarch and others.  Leucippus and Democritus evidently took this original philosophy and corrupted it into atheism.

iii. “Stratonical” Materialism

“Stratonical” materialism is a variation of Plato’s Organicism. It agrees with Plato that the universe is a single, self-organizing, entity, but stipulates that this principle is wholly unconscious and material.  Instead it grants matter the ability to initiate action.

Cudworth rejects this adaptation of Plato.  To him, it is impossible for an entity to operate in a logical, orderly manner, without both the regulation of the Essences to establish what logic and order are, and some sort of consciousness to access these principles.  There are clearly apparent, and logically predictable, patterns in the objects, and actions of the universe.  Therefore, logic and the Essences exist.

But, the Essences are phenomena of the mind of God, existing nowhere else.  So, there must be more than even activist matter in the universe.  There must be a God, and matter must have some connection to God, in order to operate in accord with the Essences, which are mental phenomena.  There must be some sort of connector between matter and spirit.  This connector would, indeed, bind the universe, in one sense, into a single entity, but not on the purely material level of atoms.

iv. Plastic Nature

Cudworth believes that this connection is provided by a form of World Soul.  He finds ancient authority to support this conception, and much more successfully than he did in reference to atomism.  This disciplining force is clearly related to the World Soul described in the Plato’s Timaeus, and in the Stoic tradition. It is also an interpretation of Plotinus’s Third Hypostasis.  Such a world-soul does indeed bind the universe into one entity, but not through mere matter.

However, the greatest influence behind Cudworth’s conception of this force was Henry More.  Originally a follower of Descartes, More eventually opposed Cartesian ontology, because due to the general Platonist distaste for mechanism.  To replace this theory, he developed his conception of “the Natural Spirit,” or “the Hylarchic Principle.”  This principle traced the causal history of events through the interaction of matter with spirit, instead of through interactions between two or more material objects, while maintaining deterministic causality for material events.  Cudworth took this idea, and called it “Plastic Nature.”

More suggested that matter and spirit both exist in space.  When an atom of matter coexists with spirit, within the same space, they become, “bound by the law of fate.”(True System, III.674)  The result is Plastic Nature.  When the active spiritual element of plastic moves in accord with the logic of the Essences, it carries the passive material atom on which it has overlaid with it, resulting in a physical event.

This overlay renders the spiritual element of Plastic Nature unconscious.  Its motion is not deliberative, but analogous to the body’s autonomic system.  Nevertheless, all spiritual actions are defined by logical principles.  So, the activities of plastic nature are rational, determined, and predictable through the exercise of reason.  This allows animals, plants, and un-living nature to behave in an orderly manner, though all three lack native intelligence.

Still, the full scope of the Essences cannot be apprehended or enacted by an unconscious hybrid like Plastic Nature.  Some of them, such as the rational principles which imply moral standards, are too subtle.  So, Plastic Nature sometimes operates amorally, or even self-destructively, as when moths seek the sun, and fly into a flame; or rain falls on the just and the unjust alike.  God might be aware of the fall of every sparrow, but he need not directly conspire in the event.  Neither need He be found responsible for the death of moths, or the democracy of the weather.  Such events are attributed to the autonomic system of the universe, operating according to a crude apprehension of the true logical order found in God’s mind.  Contemplation of this true order requires the use of a fully conscious mind, without material contamination.

c. Epistemology

i. Knowledge as Propositional

Cudworth’s epistemology is based on the understanding that all knowledge is propositional. Beliefs that cannot be expressed in a proposition, such as “All men are mortal,” are not “known.”  Thus, the elements of a logical proposition—quantifiers, subjects, predicates and copulas--must be somehow present in the mind as a precondition of knowledge.  However, none of these things are determinable by the senses.  Both subjects and predicates are universals, such as “men” and “mortal.” Quantifiers, like “all,” and copulas such as “are,” are logical relations.  Senses only have contact with individual objects and properties as they exist relative to the observer.  Therefore, propositional knowledge is not empirical in nature.  It is a judgment arising from an active intellect already possessed with some logical capacities.

As God has knowledge, these universals must also be known to Him.  They must also be the models of his creations and the rational determinants of His acts.  They must be, in short, the Essences.

ii. The Essences in Epistemology

Humans do not have the direct access to these ideas that God enjoys. Cudworth is uncomfortable with the idea that humans might have innate ideas of the Essences.  Such theories as Descartes’ imply, to him, a form of epistemic determinism with the human mind pre-programmed to know certain truths, which have inevitable logical implications.  To Cudworth, who believes that both theology and ethics were developed through human reason, instead of revelation, epistemological determinism would imply an ethical determinism, where man is bound to come to a particular conclusion in either field.  This would make human moral and epistemic error hard to explain.

Because God is perfect, a kind of determinism as to the accuracy of His knowledge and moral decisions is essential to His nature, at least in cases where one belief or option is actually better than the others.  His ideas are innate.  But, to fill what Cudworth saw as our proper role in the order of things, humans must possess a useful, but less accurate, method of developing a consciousness of the same Essences.

iii. Plastic Nature in Epistemology

The senses do have a significant epistemological role in this method.  They stimulate the rational faculties of the mind.  The physical senses, guided by Plastic Nature, react to a sense-stimulation and draw information into the mind.  But all that the senses alone can detect would be “a thing which affects our sense in respect of figure or color.”(True System, III.584)  The determination that these properties are conjoined to an object, and that the same properties are universals, capable of manifesting simultaneously in multiple objects and locations, are rational judgments.  “(The mind)… exerts ‘conceptions’...upon our perceptions” (Ibid.) so that we might know objects.

Moreover, these conceptions must represent objective, universal principles.  If they did not exist as objective and universal entities, then knowledge would be of a purely relativistic and subjective nature.  They would be “phantasms” which we would not be able to communicate with one another, because we would each exist in a different epistemological universe.  They would also be irredeemably vague, because they are without any disciplining principle, except our own will, which is in flux.  And, finally, we would be unable to infer anything from them, because they are all particular.

To Cudworth and the Platonists, this ordering role is filled by Plastic Nature.  In addition to operating material events in accord with logic, Plastic Nature is also responsible for the autonomic elements of human behavior.  Cudworth ascribes dreams, and all other operations of what we call the unconscious mind to Plastic Nature manifest in the human mind.  Included in these, Cudworth holds, are the most basic projection of order onto our perceptions, so that we can be capable of logical deliberation.

According to Cudworth, when our eyes are stimulated by seeing a white object, or a black object, Plastic Nature instinctively abstracts the notions of Whiteness or Blackness from these experiences, and submits these concepts to the conscious mind.  The same is true for all basic universals.  Now the mind has something to reason about, and may detect logical relations among them these basic Essences.  Cudworth lists these relations as “Cause, Effect, Means, End, Order, Proportion, Similitude, Dissimilitude, Equality, Inequality, Aptitude, Inaptitude, Symmetry, Asymmetry, Whole, Part, Genus, Species, and the like.”(True System, III.586)  Propositions, and thus, knowledge, become possible.

Knowing objects, we also come to see corporate entities made up of several particular individuals “which, though sometimes locally discontinued, yet are joined together by...relations...,” and, “all conspiring into one thing imperceptible by sense...yet...not mere figments.” Conceptions, of such things as a nation, are an example of such a “totem.”  “(The development of such ideas)…proceeds merely from the intuitive power and the activity of the mind” which provides just those relations which allow that abstraction to be possible.”(Ibid. 593)


…a house, or a palace is not only stone, brick, mortar, timber, iron, glass, heaped is made up of relative... notions it being a certain disposition of those materials into a ‘totem’ consisting of several parts, rooms, stairs, passages, doors, chimneys, windows, convenient for habitation, and fit for several functions among men....this logical form which is the passive stamp or print of intellectuality upon it. (Ibid. 594)

At this point, the spiritual, conscious element of the mind can also infer the existence of Essences which are not directly represented in experience.  The ideas that the mind has already developed logically imply these new ideas.  Examples of such ideas are: “Wisdom, Folly, Prudence, Imprudence, Knowledge, Ignorance, Verity, Falsity, Virtue, Vice, Honesty, Dishonesty, Justice, Injustice, Volition, Cognition, and Sense, Itself.”(Ibid. 586)  Ethics and Mathematics are also products of this process.  From our perception of universal order among material things, the mind may develop rational arguments for the existence of God.

As the disciplining of natural activities and of human thought are directly analogous functions of Plastic Nature, and are regulated by the same Essences, the logic of the human mind is always analogous to the natural order in the universe.  Where the Essences are represented in dumb matter by the laws of nature, they are represented in spirit by the activities in our mind which generate conceptions of those Essences.  Therefore, skepticism regarding the accuracy of human beliefs, as is manifest in Descartes’s “Evil Genius” thought experiment, is unjustified at this basic level.  The logic of our minds and the rationality of the universe are both emanations from the same source, and mirror each other.

iv. The Failings of Plastic Nature in Epistemology

However, after Plastic Nature has communicated the basic universals to the conscious mind, humans require more and more, at increasingly great levels of sophistication to develop these higher conceptions, unlike God, to whom they are innate. This opens the possibility of confusion or error.  For example, the conscious mind might simultaneously receive a message from its automatic epistemological processes, telling it that there is water on the horizon, and a second message from the reasoning spirit that this is a mirage.  When this occurs the problem has defeated our basic epistemological system, and the mind must choose which alternative to believe, settling the question with another faculty, the Will.

d. Free Will

Cudworth’s conception of the nature of the will is expressed in A Treatise on Freewill.  It is somewhat eccentric by the standard of his contemporaries.  To them, the human mind seems to be more the arena where will, intellect and the various passions constantly vie for power over the individual.  To Cudworth, it is far more orderly and integrated.

i. The Hegemonikon

He follows the Stoics, especially Epictetus and Iamblicus, in describing the mind as a “hegemonikon,” a conjunction of imagination, logic, passion and impulse.  According to Cudworth, the mind receives impulses from the reason, the body, and the instinctive drives of Plastic Nature in the way of a central repository.  Then it orders them, so that the whole can act as one coherent being.  It is the man …that understands, and the man that wills, as it is the man who walks, and the man that speaks or talks….”(A Treatise on Free Will, p. 25)…not merely the will, which is a product, not a component of the man.  This concept allowed for a recovery of the connection between body and mind, lost in Descartes’s dualism.  In effect, it posits what we might call the “personality” as a multi-leveled emergent locus of physical, conscious, and unconscious forces out of which psychological activity arises.

Will is the faculty which brings order to these mixed signals.  Plastic Nature links it to the most basic Essences.  These include the Essence of the Good.  So, included in its make-up is “the instinct to do good.”(A Treatise on Free Will, p. 4)  It tries to come up with the best internal order for the mind.  So, in cases where the intellect receives confused or mixed signals, the hegemonikon chooses which alternative to accept.  It is “free,” but it is not arbitrary.  It tries to arrive at the objectively right answer, but the very fact that it has been invoked means that there is no overwhelming influence determining which option to accept.

ii. God’s Choice

In some cases even the intellect of God is defeated, and is unable to discern which of a set of alternatives is better.  This is because Cudworth believes in a variety of Molina’s middle knowledge. To Cudworth, it is quite possible for two or more contradictory alternatives to really have equally forceful intellectual value.  Thus, there is no rational cause to prefer one option to the other.  In order to enact, or believe, one or the other option, the active intellect of God must have the ability to will an alternative without the guidance of predetermination.  So, God makes choices, when all of His alternatives are equally justified.  Fortunately, in God’s case, this only occurs when the alternatives actually are equally valid, so either option turns out to be perfectly right and good.

iii. Human Choice

Humans have a similar power.  But, due to the failings of our human epistemological method, sometimes we err.  In such cases, we only believe that the alternatives are all equally good, and engage the will, when the intellect alone should be enough to determine the appropriate alternative. When this happens, we might make the wrong choice, believing in the lesser truth, or performing the lesser act.  And so, moral and intellectual error enters the picture.  We are responsible for these errors because the balance of intellectual influences which required our will to act as a tie-breaker also eliminates the possibility for a predetermined solution.  We are the determining factor responsible for the action, event or belief produced.

5. Cudworth’s Influence

The Cambridge Platonists faded rather quickly from the English intellectual scene.  Most of the problems they attempted to solve were simply no longer of moment when the Restoration of the Monarchy forced a retreat of Calvinism. Also, Cudworth’s own vast erudition and the originality of his psychology were also lost in his bulky, inelegant style, controversial implications, and tendency towards mythmaking.
In 1703, Georges-Louis Le Clerc drew new attention to Cudworth, by publishing excerpts from the System.  This initiated a long debate between himself and Pierre Bayle over whether a belief in Plastic Nature could lead to atheism.  It also renewed interest in Cudworth and would eventually lead to the posthumous publications, and re-publications of his works.
Still, Cudworth’s philosophic influence is, for the most part, felt indirectly.  Damaris Cudworth Masham was a close friend to John Locke, and a correspondent with Gottfried Leibniz, whom she encouraged to publish.  Thus, parallels between Cudworth’s theories, and Locke’s seem to be no coincidence.  John Locke’s shares Cudworth’s conception of human free will, and his epistemological theory also adopts a model of the mind as an integrated collection of powers, faculties and modes.  Similarly, it may be observed that there are points of comparison between Cudworth’s conception of Plastic Nature, and Leibniz’s Theory of Pre-established Harmony.  Unfortunately, there has yet to be a complete study made of these connections.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Cragg, Gerald R. (ed.) 1968. The Cambridge Platonists. Oxford
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1731. A Treatise on Eternal and Unalterable Morality. London
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1996,  A Treatise on Free Will. Cambridge
  • Cudworth, Ralph, 1678, The True Intellectual System of the Universe. 3 vols. London
  • Patrides, C.A. 1969. The Cambridge Platonists. Cambridge

b. Secondary Sources

  • Birch, Thomas "An Account of the Life and Writings of R. Cudworth, D.D." in Cudworth, Works, 4 vols. (Oxford, 1829), 1, 7-37.
  • Carter, Benjamin. “Ralph Cudworth and the theological origins of consciousness,” in History of the Human Sciences July 2010 vol. 23 no. 3 29-47
  • Gysi, Lydia. Platonism and Cartesianism in the Philosophy of Cudworth (1962).
  • Lahteenmaki, Vili.  2010. “Cudworth on Types of Consciousness.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 18 (1):9-34.
  • Mijuskovic, Ben Lazare. The Achilles of Rationalist Arguments. The Simplicity, Unity, and Identity of Thought and Soul from the Cambridge Platonists to Kant: A Study in the History of an Argument (International Archives of the History of ideas, Series Minor 13). The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1974.
  • Muirhead, John H. The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy (1931). New York
  • Osborne, Catherine. 'Ralph Cudworth's The True Intellectual System of the Universe and the Presocratic Philosophers', in Oliver Primavesi and Katharina Luchner (eds) The Presocratics from the Latin Middle Ages to Hermann Diels (Steiner Verlag 2011)
  • Passmore, John Arthur. Ralph Cudworth: An Interpretation, University Press, University of Michigan (1951).
  • Rodney, Joel M. "A Godly Atomist in 17th-Century England: Ralph Cudworth," The Historian 32 (1970), 243-9.
  • Tulloch, J. “Rational Theology and Christian Philosophy in England in the Seventeenth Century,” reprint of 2nd ed., 2 vols. (New York, 1972), 2, 193-302. BR756 T919 Dictionary of National Biography (repr., London: Oxford University Press, 1949-1950), 5, 271-2. Biographia Britannica, 2nd ed. (London, 1778-93), 4, 544-9.


Author Information

Charles M. Richards
Tulsa Community College, Rogers State University
U. S. A.

17th Century Theories of Substance

In contemporary, everyday language, the word “substance” tends to be a generic term used to refer to various kinds of material stuff (“we need to clean this sticky substance off the floor”) or as an adjective referring to something’s mass, size, or importance (“that is a substantial bookcase”).  In 17th century philosophical discussion, however, this term’s meaning is only tangentially related to our everyday use of the term.  For 17th century philosophers the term  is reserved for the ultimate constituents of reality on which everything else depends.  This article discusses the most important theories of substance from the 17th century: those of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Although these philosophers were highly original thinkers, they shared a basic conception of substance inherited from the scholastic-Aristotelian tradition from which philosophical thinking was emerging.  In a general sense each of these theories is a way of working out dual commitments: a commitment to substance as an ultimate subject and a commitment to the existence of God as a substance.  In spite of these systematic similarities between the theories, they ultimately offer very different accounts of the nature of substance.  Given the foundational role substance plays in the metaphysical schemes of these thinkers, it will not be surprising to find that these theories of substance underlie dramatically different accounts of the nature and structure of reality.

Table of Contents

  1. 17th Century Theories of Substance: A Shared Background
  2. Descartes
    1. Descartes’ Account of Substance
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Are Embodied Human Beings Substances?
    4. How is Substance Independent?
    5. How Many Material Substances?
  3. Spinoza
    1. Spinoza’s Account of Substance
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Why doesn’t Spinoza Countenance Created Substance?
    4. How Can a Substance Have More than One Attribute?
    5. An Extended and Indivisible Substance?
  4. Leibniz
    1. Leibniz’s Account of Substances
    2. What Substances are There?
    3. Experience and Reality
    4. What is Wrong with Composite Beings?
    5. Leibniz and Spinoza
  5. 17th Century Theories of Substance in Perspective
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts in English
    2. Secondary Texts

1. 17th Century Theories of Substance: A Shared Background

In thinking about 17th century accounts of substance we need to keep in mind that a concern with substance and its nature was nothing new to the period. In fact, philosophical thinking about the nature of substance stretches all the way back to ancient Greece.  While the new philosophers of the 17th century were keen to make a break with the past and to tackle philosophical and scientific problems from new foundations, their views did not develop in an intellectual vacuum.  Indeed, the scholastic-Aristotelian tradition of the day informed their thinking about substance in a number of ways, and contributed to a number of commonalities in their thought. Before looking at specific theories of substance, it is important to note four commonalities in particular.

Substance, Mode, Inherence

For the philosophers we will discuss, at the very deepest level the universe contains only two kinds or categories of entity: substances and modes.  Generally speaking, modes are ways that things are; thus shape (for example being a rectangle), color (for example redness), and size (for example length) are paradigm modes.  As a way a thing is, a mode stands in a special relationship with that of which it is a way.  Following a tradition reaching back to Aristotle’s Categories, modes are said to exist in, or inhere in, a subject.  Similarly, a subject is said to have or bear modes.  Thus we might say that a door is the subject in which the mode of rectangularity inheres.  One mode might exist in another mode (a color might have a particular hue, for example), but ultimately all modes exist in something which is not itself a mode, that is, in a substance.  A substance, then, is an ultimate subject.

Independence and Priority

The new philosophers of the 17th century follow tradition in associating inherence with dependence.  They all agree that the existence of a mode is dependent in a way that the existence of a substance is not.  The idea is that modes, as the ways that things are, depend for their existence on that of which they are modes, e.g. there is no mode of ‘being 8’0 long’ without there being a subject that is 8’0 long.  Put otherwise, the view is that the existence of a mode ultimately requires or presupposes the existence of a substance.  This point is sometimes put by saying that substances, as subjects, are metaphysically prior to modes.

Degrees of Reality

In contrast to contemporary philosophers, most 17th century philosophers held that reality comes in degrees—that some things that exist are more or less real than other things that exist.  At least part of what dictates a being’s reality, according to these philosophers, is the extent to which its existence is dependent on other things: the less dependent a thing is on other things for its existence, the more real it is.  Given that there are only substances and modes, and that modes depend on substances for their existence, it follows that substances are the most real constituents of reality.

God Exists and is a Substance

Furthermore, each of the philosophers we will discuss maintains (and offer arguments on behalf of the claim) that God exists, and that God’s existence is absolutely independent.  It is not surprising then, given the above, that each of these philosophers holds that God is a substance par excellence.

2. Descartes

Descartes’ philosophical system, including his account of substance was extremely influential during the 17th century.  For more details see the IEP entry René Descartes: Overview.  Unlike Spinoza and Leibniz, however, Descartes’ theory of substance was not the centerpiece of his philosophical system.  Nonetheless, Descartes offered a novel theory of substance which diverged in important ways from the Scholastic-Aristotelian tradition.

a. Descartes’ Account of Substance

It is sometimes said that Descartes gives two different definitions of substance, and indeed in the Principles and Second Replies he defines substance in distinct ways.  We should not, however, see this as evidence that Descartes changed his mind.  On the contrary, it is clear that for Descartes these definitions express two sides of a unified account of substance.

Let us begin with the definition he offers in his Principles of Philosophy (I.51-52).  There he defines ‘substance’ in terms of independence.  He begins by making clear that there are really two different philosophical senses of the term (corresponding to two degrees of independence).  For reasons that will become clear in a moment, let us distinguish the two senses by calling one Substance and the other Created Substance.  Descartes’ definitions can be paraphrased as follows:

Substance: A thing whose existence is dependent on no other thing.

Created Substance: A thing whose existence is dependent on nothing other than God.

Strictly speaking, for Descartes there is only one Substance (as opposed to Created Substance), since there is only one thing whose existence is independent of all other things: God.  However, within the universe that God has created there are entities the existence of which depends only on God.  These lesser substances are the ultimate constituents of the created world.

The definition of substance that Descartes offers in the Second Replies (and elsewhere), ignores the distinction between God and creation and defines substance in a much more traditional way, claiming that a substance is a subject that has or bears modes, but is not itself a mode of anything else.  This fits right in with his other comments about substance in the Principles.  Thus, he tells us that each created substance has exactly one attribute (Principles I. 53).  An attribute of a substance, Descartes explains, is its “principle property which constitutes its nature and essence, and to which all its other properties are referred” (Ibid.).  A substance’s attribute, consequently, dictates its kind since attributes “constitute” a substance’s nature and all and only those things of the same nature are of the same kind.  Moreover, in claiming that all a substance’s properties are referred through the substance’s attribute, Descartes is claiming that a substance’s attribute dictates the properties that a substance may have.

Descartes specifies two attributes: thought and extension.  Consequently, there are at least two kinds of created substance—extended substances and thinking substances.  By ‘extension’ Descartes just means having length, breadth, and depth.  More colloquially we might say that to be extended is just to take up space or to have volume.  Whereas by ‘thinking substance’ Descartes just means ‘mind’.  Although Descartes only ever discusses these two attributes, he never explicitly rules out the possibility of other attributes.  Nevertheless, the tradition has interpreted Descartes as holding that there are only two kinds of created substance and it is for this reason that Descartes is often called a substance dualist.

With this specification in hand we are in a better position to understand what Descartes means when he says that all a substance’s properties are referred through the substance’s attribute or “principle property.”  Consider an extended substance, say, a particular rock.  Among this rock’s properties are shape and size; but having these properties presupposes the property of extension.  Put otherwise, something cannot have a shape or a size without also being extended.  Furthermore, the properties that the rock may have are limited to modifications of extension—a rock cannot have the property of experiencing pain for example, since the property of experiencing pain is not a way of being extended.   In general, we can say that for Descartes i) the attribute of a substance is its most general property, and that ii) every other property of a substance is merely a specification of, way of being, or mode of that attribute.

b. What Substances are There?

Given this account of the nature of substance, what substances exist?  Descartes famously argues in Meditation Six that human minds and bodies are really distinct—that is, that they are each substances.  Indeed, every individual consciousness or mind is a thinking substance.  Furthermore Descartes treats bodies, including the objects of our everyday experience (chairs, trees, spoons, etc.) as extended substances. This makes sense: extension is an attribute of substance, so it would seem to follow that anything that is extended (has the attribute of extension) is itself a substance.  Moreover the parts of extended substances, as themselves extended, would seem to be extended substances for Descartes (see Principles I. 60). Given that Descartes thinks that matter is infinitely divisible (Principles II. 20)—that each part of matter is itself extended all the way down—it follows that there are an infinite number of extended substances.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  The most real thing is God on which all other things depend.  However, within the created realm there are entities that are independent of everything besides God.  These are the created substances.  Created substances come in two kinds—extended substances and minds, and there is a plurality of both.

This brief summary of Descartes’ account of substance raises a number of deeper questions and controversies.  One central question that naturally arises is why Descartes thinks that extension and thought are the most general properties of substances.  For a detailed discussion of Descartes’ reasons see the IEP entry René Descartes: The Mind-Body Distinction. This entry will briefly consider the role of embodied human beings in Descartes metaphysics, what Descartes means in calling substances independent, and a related controversy concerning the number of material substances to which Descartes is entitled.

c. Are Embodied Human Beings Substances?

Embodied human beings fit uneasily into Descartes’ metaphysics.  As embodied, humans are composite beings; an embodied human being consists of a mental substance (our mind) and a physical one (our body), for Descartes.  Descartes thinks that this composite being is, however, something over and above a mere aggregation.  He writes in Mediation Six: “Nature also teaches me…that I am not merely present in my body as a sailor is present in a ship, but that I am very closely joined and, as it were, intermingled with it, so that I and the body form a unit” (my italics).  In general, it is clear that Descartes thinks that embodied humans are exceptional beings in some regard, but how we should understand this mind/body union and its place in Descartes’ metaphysics has been a matter of some controversy among scholars.  One of the more prominent disputes has been between those scholars who read Descartes as holding that embodied human beings are a distinct kind of created substance, and those scholars who do not.  The former see Descartes as a substance trialist, whereas the latter read him along traditional lines as a substance dualist.  For trialist readings see Hoffman 1986 and Skirry 2005: Chapter 4).  For recent defenses of substance dualism against trialist interpretations see Kaufman 2008 and Zaldivar 2011.

d. How is Substance Independent?

As we have seen, Descartes defines substance in terms of independence.  This, however, is only a very general claim.  In order to better understand Descartes’ account of substance we need to have a better idea of the way in which substances are independent.  On one hand, in his thinking about substance Descartes is working with the traditional conception of independence according to which a substance’s existence is independent in a way that a mode’s existence is not, since substances are ultimate subjects.  Accordingly, let us say that substances are subject-independent.  On the other hand, in his account of substance Descartes is also working with a causal sense of independence.  After all, the reason that God is the only Substance (as opposed to Created Substance) is that all other things “can exist only with the help of God’s concurrence” (Principles I.51), and Descartes understands this as the causal claim that all other things are God’s creation and require his continual conservation.  Consequently scholars have seen Descartes as holding that in general i) God is both causally and subjectively independent (God is not, after all, a mode of anything else), ii) created substances are causally independent of everything but God and subjectively independent, and iii) modes are both causally and subjectively dependent in that they both depend on God’s continual conservation and on created substances as subjects. (See for example, Markie 1994: 69; Rodriguez-Pereyra 2008: 79-80)

e. How Many Material Substances?

That created substances are causally independent of everything but God suggests a startling conclusion—that despite what Descartes seems to say, bodies are not material substances, since they are not sufficiently independent.  Bodies are causally dependent on other bodies in a host of different ways.  For example, bodies come to be and are destroyed by other bodies: a person is the product of  their parents and could die as the result of getting hit by a car.  Indeed, according to one scholarly tradition, there is only one material thing that satisfies Descartes’ definition of created substance—the material universe as a whole (see for example, Cottingham 1986: 84-85).  Again, following tradition we can call this view the Monist Interpretation, and the opposing view that there are many material substances, the Pluralist Interpretation (for a distinct view see Woolhouse 1993: 22-23).  It would appear, then, that there is philosophical evidence of Monism; in other words, it would seem that Descartes’ views about created substance commit him to thinking there can be only one material substance.  Proponents of this interpretation claim that there is textual evidence as well, pointing to a passage in the Synopsis to the Meditations.  There Descartes writes:

[W]e need to recognize that body, taken in the general sense, is a substance, so that it too never perishes.  But the human body, in so far as it differs from other bodies, is simply made up of a certain configuration of limbs and other accidents of this sort; whereas the human mind is not made up of any accidents in this way, but is a pure substance.

Monists read ‘body, taken in the general sense’ as referring to the material universe as a whole.  Consequently, they see this passage as claiming that the material universe is a substance, but that the human body is not—since it is made up on a configuration of limbs and accidents.   Assuming the monists are right, two questions immediately arise.  First, if bodies are not substances, then what are they?  Monists typically claim that bodies are modes.  This makes sense: if bodies are not substances, they must be modes, given Descartes’ ontology.  Second, if Descartes does not think that bodies are substances, why does he so often talk as if they are?  Monists answer that Descartes is speaking loosely in these contexts using the term ‘substance’ in a secondary or derivative sense of the term.

Pluralists have objected on a number of grounds.  First, pluralists have challenged the monist’s textual evidence, offering alternative readings of the Synopsis.  Second, they have challenged the motivation of monism, pointing out that the monist interpretation requires a very strong conception of causal independence, and that it just isn’t clear that this is Descartes’ view. Third, pluralists note that although Descartes writes of bodies as substances on numerous occasions, he never clearly refers to them as modes.  Last, pluralists have denied that Descartes could have held that bodies are modes noting that for Descartes i) parts of things are not modes of them and ii) bodies are parts of the material universe.  Hoffman 1986 briefly raises each of these objections.  For more lengthy discussions see Skirry 2005: Chapter 3 and Slowik 2001.

3. Spinoza

Spinoza’s most important work is his Ethics Demonstrated in Geometric Order—henceforth the Ethics. Spinoza worked on the text throughout the 1660s and 70s.  By this time Descartes’ philosophy had become widely read and indeed Spinoza’s thinking was heavily influenced by it—including his account of substance.  Nevertheless, Spinoza’s account diverges in important ways and leads to a radically different picture of the world.

a. Spinoza’s Account of Substance

Spinoza offers a definition of substance on the very first page of the Ethics.  He writes:  “By substance I understand what is in itself and is conceived through itself... “ (E1d3).  Spinoza follows Descartes (and the tradition) in defining substance as “in itself” or as an ultimate subject.  Correspondingly, he follows the tradition in defining ‘mode’ as that which is had or borne by another; as Spinoza puts it a mode is “that which is in another…” (E1d5).  For a discussion of the scholastic-Aristotelian roots of Spinoza’s definition see Carriero 1995.  Spinoza also follows Descartes in thinking that i) attributes are the principle properties of substance, ii) among those attributes are thought and extension, iii) all other properties of a substance are referred through, or are ways of being, that attribute, and iv) God exists and is a substance.  Here the agreement ends.

The first obvious divergence from Descartes is found at E1P5.  For Descartes there are many extended substances (at least on the pluralist interpretation) and many minds.  Spinoza, however, thinks this is dead wrong.  At E1P5 Spinoza argues that substance is unique in its kind—there can be only one substance per attribute.  This fact about substance (in combination with a number of other metaphysical theses) has far-reaching consequences for his account of substance.

It follows, Spinoza argues at E1P6, that to be a substance is to be causally isolated, on the grounds that i) there is only one substance per kind or attribute and ii) causal relations can obtain only between things of the same kind.  Causal isolation does not, however, entail causal impotence.  An existing substance must have a cause in some sense, but as causally isolated its cause cannot lie in anything outside itself.  Spinoza concludes that substance “will be the cause of itself…it pertains to the nature of a substance to exist” (E1P7).  Not only is a substance the cause of itself, but Spinoza later tells us that it is the immanent cause of everything that is in it (E1P18).  Spinoza continues, in E1P8, by claiming that “every substance is necessarily infinite.”  In general Spinoza argues that if there is only one substance per attribute, then substance cannot be limited since limitation is a causal notion and substances are causally isolated.  Last, Spinoza makes the case that substances are indivisible.  He argues in E1P12-13 that if substance were divisible, it would be divisible either into parts of the same nature or parts of a different nature.  If the former, then there would be more than one substance of the same nature which is ruled out by E1P5.  If the latter, then the substance could cease to exist which is ruled out by E1P7; consequently substance cannot be divided.

b. What Substances are There?

Given this account of the nature of substance, what substances exist?  From what has been said so far in the Ethics it would be reasonable to suppose that, for Spinoza, reality consists of the following substances: God, one extended substance, one thinking substance, and one substance for every further attribute, should there be any.  As it turns out, however, this is only partially right.  It is true that Spinoza ultimately holds that God exists, that there is one extended substance, and one thinking substance.  However, Spinoza denies that these are different substances. The one thinking substance is numerically identical to the one extended substance which is numerically identical to God.  Put otherwise, there is only one substance, God, and that substance is both extended and thinking.

Spinoza’s official argument for this conclusion is at E1P14.  He argues as follows: God exists (which was proven at E1P11).  Given that God is defined as a being that possesses all the attributes (E1d6) and that there is only one substance per attribute (E1P5), it follows that God is the only substance.  For a detailed discussion of this argument see the IEP entry Spinoza: Metaphysics.

Given that God is the only substance and Spinoza’s substance/mode ontology, it follows that the material objects of our experience are not independently existing substances, but instead are modes of the one extended substance.  So too, minds which Descartes had thought of as thinking substances are, according to Spinoza, modes of the attribute of thought.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  Like Descartes, Spinoza holds that the most real thing is God on which all other things depend.  However, there are no created substances.  God as the one substance has all the attributes, and consequently is both an extended substance and a thinking one.  What Descartes had taken for created substances are actually modes of God.  Nevertheless, Spinoza agrees with Descartes that the contents of reality come in two kinds—modes of extension and modes of thought, and there is a plurality of both.

This account of the nature of substance yields a very different picture of the metaphysical structure of the world from Descartes (and from common sense).  This entry will focus on three questions in particular: i) why doesn’t Spinoza accept created substances, ii) how can a substance have more than one attribute, and iii) how can a substance be indivisible as Spinoza suggests?

c. Why doesn’t Spinoza Countenance Created Substance?

Spinoza will not countenance Descartes’ distinction between Substance and Created Substance for a number of reasons.  First, created substances are the causal products of God.  However, substances are causally isolated, and so even if there were multiple substances, one could not be the causal product of the other.  Second, as we have seen Descartes holds that despite their causal dependence on God, finite minds and bodies warrant the name ‘substance’ at least partially because such beings are ultimate subjects.  Spinoza agrees that being an ultimate subject is an essential part of being a substance; the problem is that finite bodies and minds are not ultimate subjects.  Spinoza’s official grounds for this thesis are found in the arguments for E1P4 and 5.  In general, Spinoza claims that what is distinctive of substances as ultimate subjects is that they can be individuated by attribute alone.  According to Spinoza there are only two kinds of mark by which entities might be individuated—by attribute and by mode.  Substances as ultimate subjects cannot be individuated by mode, since subjects are metaphysically prior to modes.  Two finite bodies, for example, are not individuated by attribute (since they are both extended) and so cannot be substances.

d. How Can a Substance Have More than One Attribute?

As we’ve seen, for Descartes each substance has one—and only one—attribute.  Spinoza’s argument for substance monism, on the other hand, claims that there is a substance that possesses all the attributes.  Spinoza justifies this move defensively; at E1P10s Spinoza claims that nothing we know about the attributes entails that they must belong to different substances, and consequently there is nothing illegitimate about claiming that a substance may have more than one attribute.  Although this is Spinoza’s stated defense, a number of scholars have claimed that Spinoza has the philosophical resources to make a much stronger argument.  Specifically, they claim he has a positive case that, in fact, a substance possessing anything less than all the attributes (and hence, just one) is impossible.  In brief Lin 2007 asks us to suppose that Spinoza is wrong, and that it is possible for there to be a substance that has fewer than all of the attributes (but at least one).  Spinoza is a strong proponent of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (see for example, E1P8s2) according to which there is an explanation for every fact.  Given the PSR it follows that there is an explanation of why the substance in question fails to have all the attributes.  However, any such explanation will have to appeal to the substance’s existing attribute (or attributes).  Attributes are conceptually independent however, and consequently one cannot appeal to an existing attribute to explain the absence of another.  For a different but closely related version of this argument see Della Rocca 2002.

e. An Extended and Indivisible Substance?

Unlike Descartes, Spinoza holds that substance is indivisible, and this raises a number of questions about the consistency of Spinoza’s account of substance.  For example, how is substance’s indivisibility consistent with Spinoza’s claims that (i) substance has many attributes which constitute its essence and (ii) that substance is extended?  For a discussion of i) see the IEP entry Spinoza: Metaphysics.  Here the focus is on ii).

Spinoza’s extended substance, or God considered under the attribute of extension, is normally understood as encompassing the whole of extended reality (though for an alternative see Woolhouse 1990).  According to a philosophical tradition going back at least to Plato’s Phaedo, to be extended or corporeal is to have parts, to be divisible, and hence to be corruptible.  Spinoza, however, holds that “it pertains to the nature of substance to exist.”  Consequently, it would seem to follow that Spinoza cannot consistently hold that substance is extended.  Spinoza was well aware of this argument and his official rejoinder is found in E1P15s.  The problem with the argument is that it is “founded only on [the] supposition that corporeal substance is composed of parts.”  On its face, this is a confusing claim—if extended or corporeal substance just is the whole of extended reality, it surely has parts.  For example, there is the part of extension which constitutes an individual human body, a part which constitutes the Atlantic Ocean, a part that constitutes Earth, etc.  Despite his wording, Spinoza is not denying that extended substance has parts in every sense of the term.  Rather, Spinoza is especially concerned to counter the idea that his extended substance is a composite substance, built out of parts which are themselves substances, and into which it might be divided or resolved.  This makes sense, since a) it is not having parts that is the problem, but being corruptible, and b) this account of extended substance as divisible into further extended substances is just what Descartes (one of the main influences on Spinoza’s thought) seems to have held.

Spinoza makes his case in two ways in E1P15s.  First, Spinoza points us back to the arguments at E1P12 and 13 for the indivisibility of substance.  Second Spinoza offers a new argument that focuses specifically on extended substance, one that, interestingly, does not presuppose the prior apparatus of the Ethics.  In putting aside his own previous conclusions, Spinoza’s apparent goal is to show that a view like Descartes’ according to which any extended substance has parts which are themselves extended substances, fails on its own terms.  In general, he argues as follows.  Consider an extended substance, say a wheel of cheese.  If the parts of this wheel are themselves extended substances, then it is—at least in principle—possible for one or more of the parts to be annihilated without any consequence for the other parts.  The idea here is that because substances are independent subjects, the annihilation of one subject cannot have any consequence for the others.  Suppose then that the middle of our wheel of cheese is annihilated; we are thus left with a “donut” of cheese.  The problem with this is that the hole in the cheese is measurable—it has a diameter, a circumference, etc.  In short, it is extended.  However, we have supposed that the extended substance—the subject of the extension—in the middle was destroyed.  We are thus left with an instance of attribute, extension, without a substance as its subject—an impossibility by both Descartes’ and Spinoza’s standards.  For detailed discussions of this argument see Huenemann 1997 and Robinson 2009.

4. Leibniz

Leibniz’s views were informed by the accounts of both Descartes and Spinoza.  In fact, Leibniz corresponded with Spinoza during the early 1670s and briefly visited with Spinoza in 1676.  Unlike Spinoza, Leibniz did not write a single authoritative account of his metaphysical system.  Not only that, but his metaphysical views changed in significant ways over his lifetime.  Nevertheless, it is possible to identify a core account of the nature of substance that runs throughout his middle to later works (from the Discourse on Metaphysics of 1686 through the Monadology of 1714).

a. Leibniz’s Account of Substances

Substances are independent and are ultimate subjects.

Like Descartes, Leibniz thinks that God is the only absolutely independent thing, and that there are, in addition, created substances which are “like a world apart, independent of all other things, except for God” (Discourse on Metaphysics §8).  Second, Leibniz explicitly agrees with Descartes, Spinoza, and the tradition in maintaining that substances are the ultimate bearers of modes or properties.  He writes “when several predicates are attributed to a single subject and this subject is attributed to no others, it is called an individual substance” (Ibid.).

Substances are unities.

To be a unity for Leibniz is to be simple and without parts, and so the ultimate constituents of reality are not composite or aggregative beings. That substances are simple has metaphysically significant consequences; Leibniz infers in the Principles of Nature and Grace and elsewhere that “Since the monads have no parts, they can neither be formed nor destroyed.  They can neither begin nor end naturally, and consequently they last as long as the universe.”  A being comes to be naturally only as the result of a composition; an entity is destroyed naturally only through dissolution or corruption.  Thus only composite entities are naturally generable or destructible.  Leibniz emphasizes, however, that substances’ unity and consequent simplicity is entirely consistent with the possession of and changes in modes or properties.

Substances are active.

To say that a substance is active is to say not only that it is causally efficacious, but that it is the ultimate (created) source of its own actions. Thus he writes, “every substance has a perfect spontaneity…that everything that happens to it is a consequence of its idea or of its being, and that nothing determines it, except God alone” (DM §32).  Substances, in some sense, have their entire history written into their very nature.  The history of each substance unfolds successively, each state causally following from the previous state according to laws.  From this it follows that if we had perfect knowledge of a substance’s state at a time and of the laws of causal succession, we could foresee the entire life of the substance.  As Leibniz elegantly put the point in the Principles of Nature and Grace “the present is pregnant with the future; the future can be read in the past; the distant is expressed in the proximate.”

Substances are causally isolated.

Like Spinoza, Leibniz holds both that substances are causally efficacious, and that their efficacy does not extend to other substances.  In other words, although there is intra-substantial causation (insofar as substances cause their own states), there is no inter-substantial causation.  Leibniz offers a number of different arguments for this claim.  On some occasions he argues that causal isolation follows from the nature of substance.  If a state of a substance could be the causal effect of some other substance, then a substance’s spontaneity and independence would be compromised.  Elsewhere he argues that inter-substantial causation is itself impossible, claiming that the only way that one substance might cause another is through the actual transfer of accidents or properties.  Thus Leibniz famously writes that substances “have no windows through which something can enter or leave.  Accidents cannot be detached, nor can they go about outside of substances” (Monadology §7).  For a more detailed discussion of Leibniz’s views of causation see the IEP entry Leibniz: Causation.

b. What Substances are There?

Although Leibniz agrees with Descartes that God is an infinite substance which created and conserves the finite world, he disagrees about the fundamental constituents of this world.  For Descartes there are fundamentally two kinds of finite substance—thinking substances or minds and extended substances or bodies.  Leibniz disagrees; according to Leibniz (and this is especially clear in the later works) there are no extended substances.  Nothing extended can be a substance since nothing that is extended is a unity.  To be extended is to be actually divided into parts, according to Leibniz, and consequently to be an aggregate.  The ultimate created substances, for Leibniz, are much more like Cartesian thinking substances, and indeed Leibniz refers to simple substances as “minds” or “souls.”  This terminology can be confusing, and it is important to be clear that in using these terms Leibniz is not thereby claiming that all simple substances are individual human consciousnesses (although human consciousnesses are simple substances for Leibniz).  Rather, there is a whole spectrum of simple substances of which human minds are a particularly sophisticated example.

We are thus left with the following picture of reality.  God exists and is responsible for creating and continually conserving everything else.  The ultimate constituents of reality are monads which are indivisible and unextended minds or mind-like substances.  Although monads are causally isolated, they have properties or qualities that continually change, and these changes are dictated by the monad’s nature itself.  Leibniz’s account of substance and his metaphysics in general, raise a number of questions.  This article will take up three in particular.  First, Leibniz’s account of substance yields (in conjunction with a number of other metaphysical commitments) a picture of reality that diverges in significant ways both from common sense and from Descartes and Spinoza.  How does our experience of an extended world of causal interaction fit into Leibniz’s metaphysical picture?  Second, that substances are unities is a crucial feature of Leibniz’s account, and it is important to consider why Leibniz is so opposed to composite substances.  Last, Spinoza and Leibniz offer very similar accounts of substance, yet end up with very different metaphysical pictures, and so this article will consider where Leibniz’s account diverges from Spinoza’s.

c. Experience and Reality

How does the world of our experience fit into Leibniz’s account of reality?  Our everyday experience is of extended objects causally interacting, but for Leibniz at the fundamental level there is no inter-substantial causation and there are no extended substances.  How, then, is the world of our experience related to the world as it really is?

Let us begin with the apparent causal relations between things.  Recall that, for Leibniz, monads are active and spontaneous.  Each individual human mind is a monad, and this means that all of a human’s experiences—including their sensations of the world—are the effects of their own previous states.  For example, a person’s sensation of a book’s being on the desk is not caused by the book (or the light bouncing off the book, entering the eye,…etc.) but is rather a progression in the unfolding of the history written into the person’s nature.  Although a monad’s life originates from its nature alone, God has created the world so that the lives of created monads perfectly correspond.  Leibniz writes in A New System of Nature,

God originally created the soul (and any other real unity) in such a way that everything must arise for it from its own depths…yet with a perfect conformity relative to external things...There will be a perfect agreement among all these substances, producing the same effect that would be noticed if they communicated through the transmission of species or qualities, as the common philosophers imagine they do.

Thus, when Katie walks around the corner and sees Beatrice, and Beatrice sees Katie, they do so because it was written into Katie’s very nature that she would see Beatrice, and into Beatrice’s nature that she would see Katie.  This is Leibniz’s famous doctrine of pre-established harmony.  For more see the IEP entry Leibniz: Metaphysics.

How does our experience of an extended world of bodies arise? To start, Leibniz certainly doesn’t think that bodies are built out of, or are composites of, monads.  Thus he writes in his Notes on Comments by Michel Angelo Fardella, “just as a point is not a part of a line…so also a soul is not a part of matter.”  Instead in many cases Leibniz characterizes bodies as phenomena or appearances.  He writes in an oft-cited passage to DeVolder:

[M]atter and motion are not substances or things as much as they are the phenomena of perceivers, the reality of which is situated in the harmony of the perceivers with themselves (at different times) and with other perceivers.

Leibniz seems to be saying here and elsewhere that bodies are merely appearances (albeit shared appearances) that do not correspond to any mind-independent reality, and indeed a number of scholars have claimed that this is Leibniz’s considered view (see for example, Loeb  1981: 299-309).  In other texts however Leibniz claims that bodies result from, or are founded in, aggregates of monads, and this suggests that bodies are something over and above the mere perceptions of monads.  In general, scholars have offered interpretations that attempt to accommodate both sets of texts and which see bodies as being aggregates of monads that are perceived as being extended.  There is a great deal of debate, however, about how such aggregates might ultimately be related to bodies and their perception (for one account see Rutherford 1995b: 143-153).

d. What is Wrong with Composite Beings?

Leibniz thinks composite beings are excluded as possible substances on a number of grounds.  First, no composite is (or can be) a unity, since according to Leibniz there is no way that two or more entities might be united into a single one.  He famously illustrates this claim by appealing to two diamonds.  He writes in his Letters to Arnauld: “One could impose the same collective name for the two…although they are far part from one another; but one would not say that these two diamonds constitute a substance…Even if they were brought nearer together and made to touch, they would not be substantially united to any greater extent… contact, common motion, and participation in a common plan have no effect on substantial unity.”  In general, there is no relation that two or more entities might be brought into that would unify them into a single being.

A second and perhaps even deeper problem with composites is that according to Leibniz they cannot be ultimate subjects. He writes, again in the Letters to Arnauld, “It also seems that what constitutes the essence of a being by aggregation is only a mode of things of which it is composed.  For example, what constitutes the essence of an army is only a mode of the men who compose it.”  Leibniz’s claim is that no aggregate is a substance because aggregates are modes or states of their parts, and no mode is an ultimate subject.  This leaves us with a question, however: why does Leibniz think that aggregates are mere modes or states of their parts?  In his influential book R.C. Sleigh (1990: 123-124) makes the case that Leibniz’s grounds for thinking aggregates are modes is that aggregates are semantically and ontologically dispensable.  That is, everything that is true of an aggregate can be expressed by attributing various modes to the parts, all without appealing to the aggregate itself.  This tells us that that all of an aggregate’s purported modes are in fact modes of the parts, and that consequently the aggregate is not an ultimate subject.  Given a substance/mode ontology, it follows that to the extent that aggregates exist, they must be modes.

e. Leibniz and Spinoza

Although Spinoza and Leibniz offer very different pictures of the structure of reality, their respective accounts of substance overlap in important ways: both agree that to be a substance is to be at least i) an ultimate subject, ii) causally isolated but causally efficacious, and iii) indivisible.  Indeed, a number of scholars have suggested that Leibniz briefly adopted or was at least tempted by a Spinozistic metaphysics early in his philosophical career (see for example, the discussion in Adams 1994: 123-130).  Even later in life Leibniz seems to have held Spinoza’s views in high regard saying in a Letter to Louis Bourguet that “[A]ccording to Spinoza…there is only one substance.  He would be right if there were no monads.”  Given this it is worth considering where Leibniz breaks with Spinoza and why.

Although they differ in a number of important ways, perhaps the most prominent difference between the metaphysics of Spinoza and Leibniz is that Leibniz holds that reality is split into two: God and creation.  God is a substance and He produces finite substances—created monads.  This signals a break from Spinoza in at least two significant ways.  First, it means that Leibniz’s agreement with Spinoza about the causal isolation of substances applies only to created substances; although for Leibniz God is a substance, He is not causally isolated.  Recall that at least one of Leibniz’s reasons for denying inter-substantial causation is that it would require the actual transfer of properties or accidents, and that such a transfer is impossible.  Jolley (2005) makes the case that, for Leibniz, God’s causal activity is of a different kind.  God does not produce effects in a metaphysically intolerable way, and consequently, God need not be causally isolated.

Second, Leibniz holds, in contrast to Spinoza, that created substances are ultimate subjects.  Leibniz is very explicit about his objection to Spinoza on this score.  Although he agrees that substances require individuation, he holds that Spinoza’s proof at E1P5 that there can be only one substance per nature or attribute is unsound.  Furthermore Leibniz holds that Monads can be individuated, ultimately claiming in the Monadology that “Monads…are…differentiated by the degrees of their distinct perceptions.”

5. 17th Century Theories of Substance in Perspective

Looking back we might see Descartes, but especially Spinoza and Leibniz, as working through the metaphysical consequences of holding that substances are ultimate subjects.  More generally, we can see these theories of substance as different ways of trying to reconcile the notion of substance as an ultimate subject with a commitment to God’s existence and independence.

Epistemological considerations led prominent late 17th and 18th century philosophers to abandon such questions, and to give substance a much more modest position in their metaphysical systems.  John Locke, for example, holds that there are substances and that they are ultimate subjects, but is wary of drawing any further conclusions.  As Locke famously claims, “if any one will examine himself concerning his Notion of pure Substance in general, he will find he has no other Idea of it at all, but only a Supposition of he knows not what support of such Qualities...commonly called Accidents” (EHU 2.23.2).  David Hume goes further claiming that it is not within out power to know the ultimate structure of reality, and that further that our idea of a substance as a subject is merely the result of our imagination: “the imagination is apt to feign something unknown and invisible, which it supposes to continue the same under all these variations; and this unintelligible something it calls a substance” (Treatise 1.4.3).  Humean skepticism about substance (and about metaphysics more generally) survives in one form or another to the present day.

Of course not everyone agrees with this tradition, and the nature of substance has been a question that many contemporary philosophers have taken up—albeit from different starting points than Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Unlike the 17th century, in contemporary philosophical use the term ‘substance’ is not necessarily intended to refer to the ultimate constituents of reality (although it may).  Rather the term is usually taken to refer to what are sometimes called “concrete particulars”, that is, to individual material things or objects.  Furthermore, among contemporary philosophers there is nothing like the consensus that we find among the 17th century philosophers regarding ontology, dependence, reality, and God.  Thus, it is commonly held that there are categories of reality beyond substance and mode (or property), perhaps most prominently events or processes.  Many philosophers have questioned both the relation of inherence and the connection between inherence and ontological dependence (bundle-theories of substance, for example, deny that substances are subjects at all—they are merely bundles or collections of properties).  Furthermore, most contemporary philosophers deny that it makes sense to talk about degrees of reality: things are either real or not.  Last, and perhaps most obviously, contemporary philosophers no longer agree that God exists and is a substance.  For a contemporary effort to offer an account of substance that is in the spirit of 17th century discussions see Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1997.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Texts in English

  • Descartes
  • John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny ed. and trans. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984-1991.
    • This is the standard English edition of Descartes’ work.
  • Spinoza
  • Edwin Curley, trans. and ed. The Collected Works of Spinoza Vol. 1. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985.
    • This is the standard English translation.
  • Leibniz
  • Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber trans. and ed. G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
    • This is a great collection of many of Leibniz’ most important works.
  • Leroy L. Loemker trans. and ed. Philosophical Papers and Letters 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
    • This is a much broader collection of Leibniz’s work than the Ariew and Garber text.

b. Secondary Texts

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press, 1994.
    • This is one of the most influential books written on Leibniz in recent years.  Adams’ book includes detailed discussions of Leibniz on modality and identity, the ontological argument, and the place of bodies in Leibniz’s mature metaphysics, among other topics.
  • Carriero, John.  “On the Relationship Between Mode and Substance in Spinoza’s Metaphysics,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 33, no. 2 (1995), pp. 245-273.
    • In this article Carriero argues that Spinoza’s account of substance is a traditional one according to which substances are ultimate subjects.
  • Cottingham, John.  Descartes.  New York: Blackwell, 1986.
    • This is a good introduction to Descartes thought, and raises the question of a trialist interpretation.
  • Cottingham, John. The Rationalists.  Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1988.
    • This is a clearly written summary and comparison of the philosophies of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz.  Chapter 3 on substance is recommended.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  “Spinoza’s Substance Monism,” Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes. Ed. Olli Koistinen and John Biro. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • In this article Della Rocca considers Spinoza’s official argument that there is only one substance, and defends it from a number of objections—including the claim that Spinoza is not entitled to hold that substance can have more than one attribute.
  • Della Rocca, Michael.  Spinoza. Routledge: 2008.
    • This book is an excellent overview of Spinoza’s life and philosophy; Della Rocca’s discussion of Spinoza’s account of substance in contrast to Descartes’ is especially good.
  • Huenemann, Charles. “Predicative Interpretations of Spinoza’s Divine Extension,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, vol. 14, no. 1 (1997), pp. 53-76.
    • In this article Huenemann offers an account of Spinoza’s extended substance which differs from other influential interpretations in important ways.  In doing so, he takes up the question of the divisibility of substance and Spinoza’s vacuum argument.
  • Hoffman, Paul.  “The Unity of Descartes’s Man,” Philosophical Review, vol. 95, no. 3 (1986), pp. 339-370.
    • In this often cited article, Hoffman makes the case for a trialist reading of Descartes and along the way offers a number of criticisms of monist interpretations of substance.
  • Hoffman, Joshua, and Rosenkrantz, Gary S.  Substance: Its Nature and Existence.  Routledge, 1997.
    • In this book Hoffman and Rosenkrantz draw on the ideas of philosophers from the past (including Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz) as well as from contemporary philosophical advancements to develop and defend an account of substance based on independence.
  • Jolley, Nicholas.  Leibniz. Routledge: 2005.
    • This book is an excellent overview of Leibniz’s life and philosophy.  The book is written for the non-specialist and would be a good place for a person with no previous knowledge to start.
  • Kaufman, Dan. “Descartes on Composites, Incomplete Substances, and Kinds of Unity,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, vol. 90, no. 1 (2008), pp. 39-73.
    • In this excellent article Kaufman argues the Descartes is a dualist and that the trialist interpretation espoused by Hoffman (see above) and others is mistaken.
  • Lin, Martin. “Spinoza’s Arguments for the Existence of God,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, vol. 75, no. 2 (2007), pp. 269-297.
    • In this article Lin takes a new look at Spinoza’s arguments for God’s existence, and attempts to defend Spinoza from the charge that it is incoherent to think that God’s has more than one (much less, all) the attributes.
  • Loeb, Louis E. From Descartes to Hume: Continental Metaphysics and the Development of Modern Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1981.
    • This book is one of the standards of the field, and in chapter 2 Loeb offers a comparison of Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz on substance.
  • Markie, Peter.  “Descartes’s Concepts of Substance,” Reason, Will and Sensation: Studies in Descartes’s Metaphysics. Ed. John Cottingham. Oxford: Clarenden Press, 1994.
    • In this influential article, Markie claims to find not two, but three accounts of substance in Descartes’ work.
  • Robinson, Thaddeus S.  “Spinoza on the Vacuum and the Simplicity of Corporeal Substance,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, vol. 26, no.1 (2009), pp. 63-81.
    • In this article Robinson offers a novel interpretation of Spinoza’s vacuum argument, and makes the case that Descartes’ account of extended substance, at least by Spinoza’s lights, is incoherent.
  • Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo.  “Descartes’s Substance Dualism and His Independence Conception of Substance,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 46, no. 1(2008), pp. 69-90.
    • In this article Rodriguez-Pereyra focuses on clarifying the respects in which Descartes’ substances are independent, and argues that other prominent features of Descartes’ account of substance follow from independence so understood.
  • Rutherford, Donald. Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995a.
    • Although written for specialists, this influential book is highly readable.  Rutherford offers an account of Leibniz’s metaphysics which gives Leibniz’s theodicy and especially important role.
  • Rutherford, Donald. “Metaphysics: The Late Period.” The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz. Ed. Nicholas Jolley.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995b.
    • This article is an excellent summary and discussion of Leibniz’s metaphysics from 1695’s New System of Nature to 1714’s Monadology, and focuses on Leibniz’s account of matter during this period.
  • Skirry, Justin.  Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature.  New York: Continuum, 2005.
    • This book traces Descartes’ scholastic influences and develops a pluralist and trialist interpretation of Descartes’ account of substance.
  • Sleigh, R.C. Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on Their Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
    • This is an extremely influential book which offers a reading of one of the most important of Leibniz’s philosophical exchanges.
  • Slowik, Edward. “Descartes and Individual Corporeal Substance,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 9 no. 1 (2001) pp. 1-15.
    • Slowik picks up where Hoffman leaves off, developing several arguments against the monist interpretation of Descartes.
  • Woolhouse, R.S. “Spinoza and Descartes and the Existence of Extended Substance,” Central Themes in Early Modern Philosophy. Ed. J.A. Cover and Mark Kulstad. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1990.
    • In this article Woolhouse offers a novel reading of Spinoza’s extended substance, claiming that it refers to an essence as opposed to an actually existing infinite extension.
  • Woolhouse, R.S. The Concept of Substance in Seventeenth Century Metaphysics.  New York: Routledge, 1993.
    • This is a good general work on substance during the 17th century.  In addition, Woolhouse offers novel readings of Descartes and Spinoza (see above) on extended substance.  This work offers an especially good look at the relations between mechanics, causation, and substance during the period.
  • Zaldivar, Eugenio E. “Descartes’s Theory of Substance: Why He Was Not a Trialist,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 19, no. 3 (2011), pp. 395-418.
    • The title says it all.  Zaldivar argues against Cottingham, Skirry, and others.

Author Information

Tad Robinson
Mullenburg College
U. S. A.

Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, Marquise de Sévigné (1626—1696)

De SevigneMadame de Sévigné was France’s preeminent writer of epistles in the seventeenth century. She appears at first glance to possess few philosophical credentials because she neither received formal philosophical instruction nor composed philosophical treatises. Yet in her extensive correspondence, De Sévigné develops a distinctive position on the philosophical disputes of her era. Rejecting the mechanistic account of nature, she supports a realist philosophy of nature, especially sensitive to the aesthetic structure of the cosmos. Sympathetic to Jansenism, De Sévigné develops a philosophy of God that stresses the divine will and the omnipresence of divine causation. Her moral psychology explores the amatory structure of human desire and the difficulty of accepting one’s mortality. Representative of neoclassicism, her philosophy of art privileges the values of harmony, proportion, and balance. An avid reader of theological and philosophical works, she provides a running commentary on the theories of her favorite contemporary authors. Her letters reflect the intellectual sophistication of the period’s salon culture, where the philosophical controversies spawned by Cartesianism had become the object of everyday discussion.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Nature
    2. Religion
    3. Moral Psychology
    4. Art
    5. Philosophical Chronicle
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on February 5, 1626, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal belonged to an ancient Burgundian aristocratic family. Her most famous ancestor was her paternal grandmother Jeanne de Chantal, the founder of the Visitation order of nuns, who was canonized a saint in 1767. Her father Celse-Bénigne de Rabutin, baron de Chantal, died during battle with the English on the island of Rhé in 1627. Her mother Marie de Coulanges, baroness de Chantal, died in 1633. The guardianship of the orphan passed to her maternal uncle Philippe de Coulanges, abbé de Livry.

Under Coulanges’s direction, the young Marie received a solid classical education.  She studied Italian, Spanish, and Latin. She read passages from Virgil in the original Latin. The poet Jean Chapelain and the linguist Gilles Ménage, who would later write The History of Women Philosophers in1690, served as tutors.

On August 4 1644, Marie married Marquis Henri de Sévigné, scion of an ancient Breton noble family. The newly married couple shared their time between the husband’s ancestral Breton residence, Les Rochers, and their Parisian townhouse in the Place des Vosges, where they participated in the life of the capital’s salons. Madame de Sévigné gave birth to a daughter, Françoise in 1646 and to a son, Charles in 1648. Her husband perished ingloriously in 1651 in the course of a duel he fought over his mistress.

The handsome and wealthy widow was the object of numerous marriage proposals, but Madame de Sévigné never remarried. She became a regular participant in the literary salon of the Hôtel de Rambouillet. During the civil war of the Fronde in1648-52, she alternately opposed and supported the royalist party. She formed a close friendship with finance minister Nicolas Fouquet, whom she would openly support during his trial and imprisonment after he fell from power in the court of Louis XIV.

Among her salon acquaintances, Sévigné counted numerous prominent authors: the memorialist Cardinal de Retz, the novelist Madame Lafayette, the moralist La Rochefocuauld, and the Cartesian essayist Corbinelli. She participated in the literary quarrels of the time, championing Corneille over Racine and becoming the object of satire in works by her cousin, the chronicler Bussy-Rabutin. An avid reader, Sévigné studied a wide range of ancient and modern works. Among the classics, she preferred Virgil, Quintilian, and Tacitus; among Italian authors, Tasso and Ariosto; among French authors, Corneille, Molière, La Fontaine, Montaigne, and Rabelais. In theological literature, she preferred Saint Augustine and the neo-Augustinian authors of the Jansenist movement: Pascal and Nicole. She had a pronounced taste for pulpit oratory, the Jesuit Bourdaloue being her favorite preacher. Her correspondence frequently cited the conversations and books she has encountered. The writings of the neo-Augustinian moralistes proved particularly influential in the development of Sévigné’s philosophical theories.

In 1669 her daughter Françoise de Sévigné married François d’Adhémar, count of Grignan. When the Grignans moved to Provence in 1671 so that the Count of Grignan could fulfill a military commission, Madame de Sévigné faced an emotional crisis. Openly admitting her idolatrous love for her daughter, Sévigné could not accept the daughter’s absence. The solution was the initiation of a correspondence between mother and daughter, which would eventually include hundreds of letters. Her other correspondents included Charles de Sévigné, Abbé de Coulanges, and Bussy-Rabutin.

During her last decades, Sévigné alternated her residence between the estate at Les Rochers and her celebrated Parisian mansion, Hôtel de Carnavalet. She made numerous trips to visit her daughter, who became a partisan of Descartes. Sévigné’s ardent attachment to her daughter was not reciprocated by Madame de Grignan, who found her mother’s frequent letters and visits suffocating. Sévigné fared little better with her son Charles, whose career as a military officer was followed by a life of profligate expenses and sexual dissipation.

Madame de Sévigné died from small pox at Madame de Grignan’s estate on April 17, 1696.

2. Works

The letters of Madame de Sévigné only slowly became a published collection of correspondence. During her lifetime, individual letters were already copied and read by members of her social circle. Circulation of letters and memoirs was not unusual in the era’s salons. The preeminent literary quality of the letters quickly established them as favored salon reading.

Bussy-Rabutin provided the first print version of Sévigné’s letters, embedded within editions of his own writings, published in 1696, 1697, and 1709. Her granddaughter Madame de Simiane supervised the first edition of her letters to Madame de Grignan in 1726; Chevalier de Perrin published a corrected edition of these letters in 1734, 1737, and 1754. An edition of newly discovered letters was published in 1773. The eighteenth-century editions of Sévigné’s correspondence should be treated with caution since the editors often corrected the prose of the letters to suit the tastes of the period.

In the nineteenth century the recognizable canon of Sévigné’s correspondence emerged. L.-J.-N. Monmerqué, after publishing editions of previously unpublished letters in 1824 and 1827, edited the 14-volume edition of the complete correspondence of Sévigné. This volume included letter fragments and newly discovered, previously unpublished, letters in 1862-66. After many expanded editions of her writings, Roger Duchêne’s 3-volume critical edition of Sévigné’s correspondence published in 1972-78 became the standard reference for scholars.

The wide diffusion of Sévigné’s writings was due primarily to the French academic establishment. Beginning in the nineteenth century, French secondary school officials used textbook and anthology versions of Sévigné’s letters to provide students with a model of epistolary French prose. Countless French courses throughout the French empire and the non-Francophone world followed the lead of French education ministers and incorporated the works of Sévigné into their curriculum.

3. Philosophical Themes

Madame de Sévigné repeatedly admits to her daughter, an ardent disciple of Descartes, that she is not a systematic philosopher. Despite this, in her correspondence, Sévigné presents her personal position on contested philosophical questions of the day. In many passages she defends her theories concerning nature, religion, moral psychology, and art. If conversant with the Cartesianism of the salons, she is personally more sympathetic to the austere Jansenism of Pascal. Her correspondence is a chronicle of the philosophical debates of her era. As Sévigné recounts in salon conversations and in comments on her extensive reading, one overhears the philosophical quarrels which agitated the learned aristocracy of the period.

a. Nature

As commentators have long noted, Sévigné’s account of nature often appears to be a forerunner of romanticism. Nature is the place of an incomparable beauty best pursued in disciplined solitude. Sévigné opposes the Cartesian conception of nature as a machine reducible to mathematical attributes of extension and movement.

Sévigné’s opposition to the mechanistic theory of nature appears most clearly in her defense of nonhuman animals as ensouled beings. The easily observable conduct of pets indicates the mental and volitional actions of which they are capable.

Speak…about your machines, the machines which love, the machines which make an election of someone, the machines which are jealous, the machines which fear. Now go on; you are mocking us. Descartes never should have tried to make us believe this [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 15, 1680].

The Cartesian theory of the machine-beast defies the data of common sense and empties nature of the various ensouled entities which populate it.

Sévigné praises those Cartesians who reject the mechanistic account of animals and defend the theory of the thinking animal.

He [Abbé de Montigny] spoke about the small parts [Cartesian language for atoms, the smallest particles of material objects] with this bishop [Bishop of Léon], who is a red-hot Cartesian, but with the same passion he also supported the theory that animals think [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 2, 1671].

Opposed to the mechanistic conception of nature, Sévigné conceives nature in aesthetic terms. Nature is a place of enchantment where the engaged observer experiences a beauty which exists in no other physical setting.

These woods are always beautiful; their greenness is a hundred times more beautiful than that of Livry. I do not know whether it is due to the quality of the trees or to the freshness of the rains, but there can be no comparison. Everything today has the same green it had during the month of May. The leaves which fall are dead but those holding on are still green. You have never gazed on such beauty [Letter to Madame de Grignan; October 20, 1675].

The site of ecstatic beauty, nature becomes quasi-miraculous.

Such beautiful natural sites serve a key anthropological purpose: they permit human beings to exercise the soul’s highest faculties in solitude. In many passages Sévigné summons her daughter to experience the spiritual peace possible only within the solitary embrace of nature.

You are thirsting to be alone. Then by God, my beloved, come to our woods! It is a perfect solitude. We are having such splendid weather there that I spend all day there until night arrives. I think about you there a thousand or two thousand times with such tenderness that I would betray it if I believed I could describe it in writing [Letter to Madame de Grignan; December 22, 1675].

It is in such a natural oasis that the soul’s capacity for introspection, religious contemplation, and loving desire can flourish.

The garden constitutes the summit of human art, perfecting the bounty of nature and transforming it for the purposes of the meditative soul.

We are in a perfect solitude here and I find myself better for it. This park is much more beautiful than anything you have ever seen. The shade created by my small trees creates a beauty that was not so well projected by the sticks we used to have [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 19, 1671].

In such a perfected natural refuge human thought and desire can reach their apex.

b. Religion

Many passages in the correspondence deal with theological issues. Sévigné’s concept of God draws primarily from Jansenism.This neo-Augustinian movement stresses divine sovereignty, predestination, the depth of human sinfulness, and complete dependence on grace for salvation. Her letters reference the many Jansenist authors who shape her theological perspective: Blaise Pascal, Pierre Nicole, Antoine Arnauld, Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, and Saint-Cyran. She describes the convent of Port Royal-des-Champs, the citadel of the Jansenist movement, with the enthusiasm of an acolyte.

This Port-Royal is a Thebiade [an austere, secluded place similar to that inhabited by the desert fathers of the church]. It is paradise. It is a desert where all the devotion of Christianity is spread out. It is a holiness radiating out into all the territory for a mile around it. There are five or six unknown solitaries [lay male auxiliaries of the convent] who live like the penitents in the days of John Climacus [a theologian of the desert fathers]. The nuns are angels on earth [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 26, 1674].

Nonetheless, Sévigné absorbs this Jansenist theological culture with her characteristic moderation and irony. When a dispute breaks out over whether Jansenists should give written submission in relation to a church condemnation of several theses allegedly defended by Jansenius, she sides with neither the seigneuses nor the nonseigneuses.

Here is another example of caution. Our sisters of Saint Martha told me, “At last, may God be praised!  God has touched the heart of this poor child [a signeuese]; she has been placed in the path of obedience and salvation.” From there I went to Port-Royal.  There I found a certain esteemed solitaire that you know.  He started by telling me, “Well, this poor gosling has signed.  Finally, God has abandoned her.  She has jumped away from him.”  As for myself, I thought I would die laughing in reflecting on their preoccupations.  Now, here is the world in all its natural color.  I believe that the middle between these extremities is always better [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 21, 1664].

Faithful to Jansenist theology, Sévigné stresses the divine will as God’s central attribute.  Even the smallest occurrences in everyday life reflect the silent work of God’s ordering of time.  The fulcrum of Sévigné’s emotional life, the rhythm of physical separation and union with her daughter is ultimately governed by God’s volition.

My dearly beloved, we’ve arrived at the point where we must go, must desire, and must pass our days one after the other just as God has pleased to give them to us. Following your example, I want to abandon myself to the sweet hope of seeing and embracing you in the upcoming month.  I want to believe that God will permit us to have this perfect joy, although nothing in the world is so easy as adding some bitterness to this joy, if we so desire. There is no moment of rest in this life. It is a goodness of Providence that that we make a truce concerning those sad reflections which could clearly disturb us on a daily basis [Letter to Madame de Grignan; Letter of July 1, 1685].

Psychological movements and physical actions reflect God’s sovereign will in the working out of history.

This omnipresence of the divine will’s activity is expressed as divine providence in the life in the individual. Discrete events in an individual’s life express in fact a providential design for the person.

Providence guides us with so much goodness in all these different times of our life that we practically do not feel it at all. This movement takes place very gradually; it is imperceptible. It is the quiet hand of the sundial we do not see at work. If at the age of twenty, we were given a glimpse of our older state in our family and someone made us see in the mirror the face we have now and the face we will have when we are sixty, the comparison between the two would make us collapse. We would be terrified. But we advance day by day. Today we are like yesterday; tomorrow we will be like today. Thus, we move on without feeling it. This is one of the miracles of Providence which I adore [Letter to Moulceau; January 27, 1687].

Under the guise of Providence, the divine will’s actions become an object of devotion.

The light of faith reveals the presence of divine providence at work in what appear to be unrelated episodes of human action, although the nature and outcome of the divine will’s actions remain obscure.

We cannot see underneath the cards, but it is this Providence which guides us along these extraordinary paths. Far from revealing the end of the novel, this action does not permit us to draw any conclusions from it or to offer any reproaches against it. Therefore, we must return to our starting point and accept without murmuring all that it pleases God to do to us [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; August 13, 1688].

This emphasis on the inscrutable nature of divine providence echoes the Jansenist insistence on the radical darkening of the human intellect, occasioned by the fall and propagated by human concupiscence.

Sévigné’s emphasis on the omnipresence of divine providence tends to reduce all causation to one cause: God. Like other Jansenist philosophers, Sévigné so underscores the omnipotence and sovereignty of God that secondary causes tend to recede, if not to disappear.

As Monsieur d’Angers says, one must let God do as he wills and ceaselessly look to his will and his providence. Without that, there is no other way to live in the world. Otherwise, one will do nothing but complain about all these poor secondary causes [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 1, 1685].

Part of metaphysical wisdom is to grasp the unique divine causation operative behind the apparent and often contradictory secondary causes. These causes wrongly dominate the concerns of most human beings.

The philosophical emphasis on divine causation is tied to a theological emphasis on the doctrine of predestination. Even in small gestures of piety, it is the divine will which causes the virtuous actions of the Christian subject. The sacramental action of a friend of Sévigné illustrates this truth.

God gave her a very particular grace, one which indicates a true predestination. It is that she went to confession on the octave of Corpus Christ with a perfect disposition and an affection that could only come from God. She then received Our Lord [in communion] in the same manner [Letter to Madame de Guitaut; June 3, 1693].

The devout soul died shortly afterward in the state of grace.

Given the centrality of the will among the divine attributes, surrender to God’s will becomes the central spiritual disposition to be cultivated by the human subject. Indeed, sanctity is nothing but complete submission to the divine will. Sévigné’s moral portrait of her friend Corbinelli underscores the volitional foundation of sanctity.

He is a man who only thinks about destroying his own willfulness, who never ceases to commune with the enemies of the devil, who are the saints of the church, a man who counts as nothing his miserable body, who suffers poverty Christianly (you would say philosophically), who never ceases to celebrate the perfections and the existence of God, who passes his life in charity and service of his neighbor, who does not seek his own delights and pleasures, and who is completely submitted to the will of God [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 15, 1690].

Like other Jansenist authors, Sévigné does not explain why this submission to the divine will is so important and so difficult, given the existence of a deterministic universe in which the divine will is omnipresent.

Authentic abandonment to the divine will manifests itself by a sharp opposition to the world. Sévigné’s portrait of a friend who has recently undergone a religious conversion indicates the strictness of this separation.

She told me it was true that God had given her graces, for which she was profoundly grateful. These graces are nothing other but a profound faith, a tender love of God, and a horror of the world, accompanied by a great distrust of herself and of her weaknesses. She is convinced that if she takes a pause from this for a moment, the divine grace would evaporate [Letter to Madame de Grignan; January 15, 1674.]

Echoing neo-Augustinian theology, this rigorous flight from the world stresses the grave sinfulness and concupiscence of a world disfigured by the fall and original sin.

Sévigné openly admits her own incapacity to live the austere renunciation from the world which she commends in her writing. She often laments her own spiritual mediocrity.

One of my great desires is to be devout….I belong neither to God nor to the devil. This state disturbs me, but between us, I find it the most natural thing in the world. We are not given to the devil because we fear God and at bottom we have religious principles; we are not given to God because his law is hard and because we don’t like to destroy ourselves. This is how the tepid operate. Their great number doesn’t bother me at all. But God hates them. So I must leave this state; there is the problem [Letter to Madame de Grignan; June 10, 1671].

Like many salonnières sympathetic to Jansenism, with its rigorous asceticism, Sévigné discovers that her aristocratic lifestyle would permit her to follow the path of renunciation only so far.

In developing her religious philosophy, Sévigné criticized two intellectual currents which she finds to be erroneous: libertinism and the Molinism of the Jesuits. Among the libertines, she singled out Ninon de Lenclos (1620-1705) for specific criticism. A religious skeptic and an emblem of sexual license, Lenclos embodied the anti-Christian creed of the more freethinking salons. “This Ninon is dangerous! If you knew how she dogmatized about religion, you would be horrified. Her zeal for perverting young people is similar to that of Monsieur Saint-Germain, whom we once saw at Livry” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; April 1, 1671]. Sévigné’s invective against Lenclos was sharpened by the fact that her own son Charles had been involved in a liaison with the famous courtesan. She also recognizes that Lenclos represented an intellectual threat to Christian orthodoxy because  the courtesan promoted her sensual Epicureanism through a series of lectures she presented at her salon and a series of letters distributed by her admirers.

Luis de Molina (1535-1600) and his Jesuit confreres propagated  another extreme in the long-simmering theological quarrel over grace ,the error of Molinism, an exaggerated defense of the role of free will in the act of salvation. Sévigné lamented the leaning of one of her granddaughters toward Molinism after having abandoned the strict Augustinianism of the convent of Gif. “It is certain that after having been at the school of Saint Augustine she finds herself at the school of Molina. This is not something to be endured” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 1, 1685]. Both the materialism of the salon libertines and the spiritual libertarianism of the Jesuits erred in their divergences from the Jansenist theories of divine causation, divine sovereignty, human sinfulness, free will, and the operations of grace.

c. Moral Psychology

Like other moralistes of the period, Sévigné studies the various psychic states of the human subject, especially those states which reveal a divided heart. She openly admits the many occasions when she herself participates in this psychological perplexity. Two phenomena in particular attract her analytic attention: the experience of human love and the difficulty in accepting one’s mortality.

In the era’s salon debates, the passion of love held pride of place. Salon authors disputed the nature of love, puzzled over its power, and distinguished the various gradations of love. In her own reflections on love, Sévigné considers love a passion so powerful that it structures personal time. The beginning, end, and recommencement of loving relationships constitute one’s personal history.

I don’t believe that I have ever read anything as moving as the account you [Bussy-Rabutin] have given me of your farewell to your mistress. Your point that love is a true re-commencer is so beautiful and so true that I am astonished that, although I’ve thought this a thousand times, I never had the wit to say it. Sometimes I’ve even noticed that friendship wanted to insert itself into this in order to alter love and that in its own way it was also a true re-commencer [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; October 7, 1655].

The passage attends to the gradations of love, such as the difference between romantic love and more disinterested friendship. In its various guises, this passion shapes the human psyche by its incessant starts, ends, and revivals.

The empire of love reveals the irreducible power of emotions in human life. Sévigné openly admits that the passions are so dominant in her own personality that she could never subscribe to the fashionable Stoicism of the salons; a moral code based on reason and duty alone would be insupportable.

Love my tenderness, love my weaknesses. As for myself, I am very well adjusted to them.  I like them far more than the sentiments of Seneca and Epictetus. My dear child, I am sentimental and affectionate up to the point of madness [Letter to Madame de Grignan; March 18, 1671].

Sévigné recognizes that in her ardent affection for her daughter love has reached the level of idolatry. The attempt to eliminate and reduce the power of love and associated passions like anger can only end in failure.

The letters also reflect a preoccupation with death.  As many commentators have noted, Sévigné dwells at length on the state funerals of France’s leading political and military figures.  She has a particular love for the genre of the funeral oration. In Sévigné’s perspective, the capacity to face and accept one’s mortality constitutes an essential trait of psychological maturity. Only then can one grasp one’s proper position in a mortal, perishing universe governed by an eternal God.

Life is brief and you [Bussy-Rabutin] are already well advanced in age. There’s no need to become impatient about it. This consolation [during a moment of misfortune] is a sad one and this remedy to your ill is worse than bad. Nonetheless, it should have its effect; so should the scarcely happier thought of the little place we have in the universe and how, in the end, it matters little whether the Count de Bussy was happy or unhappy. I know that during the tiny moment we are in this life we want to be completely happy but we must be convinced that nothing is more impossible and that if you didn’t have the worries you currently have, you would have others, according to the order of Providence [Letter to Bussy-Rabutin; August 13, 1688].

Sobering, the frank recognition of one’s mortality and one’s finiteness in the divine scheme of the universe permits the human subject to place the emotional turmoil in the pursuit of happiness within a framework of resignation.

d. Art

From the time of her early correspondence with her tutor Ménage, Sévigné revealed her aesthetic preoccupations. Many letters present her critical judgments concerning particular authors, books, and dramas. Her aesthetic judgment reflects the neoclassical tastes of her milieu; harmony, balance, and proportion emerge as the central traits of artistic quality.  Questions of form dominate her critical evaluation of the artworks which pass under review.

In literature, the capacity to appreciate a work lies largely in the ability to detect and savor its interior harmony. The classics of antiquity and the Italian Renaissance reveal this interior proportion.

Your readings are good. Petrarch must entertain you with the commentary you have. The one Mademoiselle Scudéry has made for us on certain sonnets makes them pleasant to read. As for Tacitus, you know how I was charmed by him during your recitations and how I often interrupted you to make you understand the passages where I found some harmony [Letter to Madame de Grignan; June 28, 1671].

The ability to isolate and appreciate the interior balance of a literary work is the central condition for its proper aesthetic appreciation. Despite her preference for the dramas of Corneille, Sévigné admits her admiration for Racine’s Esther. Originally performed by the students at Madame de Maintenon’s academy at Saint-Cyr, the biblical drama perfectly allies religious truth to a careful balance of its component parts.

As for Esther, I am in no way taking back all the praise which I already gave it.  All my life I will be delighted by the perfection and the novelty of the show. I am thrilled by it.  I found in it a thousand things so right, so well placed, so important to say to a king, that I would be delighted with the greatest conviction to say that it presented the greatest truths as it entertained and sang to us. I was moved by all these different beauties [Letter to Madame de Grignan; Letter of March 23, 1689].

Allied to the scriptural truths of supplication by an oppressed Israel, Esther provokes this aesthetic delight through its careful arrangement of a thousand things in a perfect harmony. It is this formal composition of disparate parts which constitutes the poignant beauty of Racine’s drama.

As in literature and theater, harmony forms the key criterion in the judgment of visual art. A spectacular temporary mausoleum designed by Le Brun in the church of the Oratoire elicits Sévigné’s praise. The exhibit not only perfectly balances its physical decorations; it brilliantly evokes the spiritual balance among the fine arts and among the moral virtues.

The mausoleum touched the ceiling and was decorated with a thousand lights and several figures appropriate to the deceased one wanted to praise. Four skeletons at the bottom were decorated with marks of his dignity, as if they had removed his honors as they had removed his life. One of them carried his staff, another his ducal crown, another signs of his rank, another the vestment of chancellor. The four Arts were bent over and desolate because they had lost their protector: they were Painting, Music, Eloquence, and Sculpture. Four Virtues supported the previous presentation: Force, Justice, Temperance, and Religion. Four angels or four genies received this beautiful soul above it all. In addition, the mausoleum was decorated with angels who held up a funeral tent suspended from the ceiling. Nowhere has there ever been anything so magnificent, so perfectly imagined. It is the masterpiece of Le Brun [Letter to Madame de Grignan; May 6, 1672].

It is the intricate harmony among the varied physical, aesthetic, moral, and religious components which gives Le Brun’s baroque construction its overwhelming aesthetic impact.

In her valorization of aesthetic pleasure, Sévigné criticizes a censorship which would eliminate certain works of art on the grounds of alleged immorality. “You know that I do not accommodate myself well with all this prudery which does not come naturally to me. I don’t consent to no longer like these [morally questionable] books. I let myself be amused by them” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; July 5, 1671]. As an example of such morally questionable reading, she cites her reading of the works of Rabelais with her son Charles.

e. Philosophical Chronicle

In addition to the presentation of her own philosophical opinions, Sévigné provides a chronicle of the philosophical culture of the salon. Many of her letters describe the Cartesianism and anti-Cartesianism which had become a central feature of the intellectual culture of French salons in the middle of the seventeenth century. An avid reader, Sévigné often confides her reactions to the theories expounded by the fashionable philosophers of the day.

Among her chronicles of Cartesianism is Sévigné’s description of a philosophical debate which occurred in her own Breton home. The disputants weigh the merits of the Cartesian theory of innate ideas against the neo-Aristotelian theory of the role of sensation in the generation of knowledge.

We had here a little tempest of men and of theories and the next day was another scene.  Monsieur de Montmoron, who as you know is quite intelligent, arrived; then there was Father Damaie, who lives only twenty leagues from here; and then my son, whom as you know excels in debate; and then we had some letters from Corbinelli….Monsieur de Montmoron knows your [Madame de Grignan’s] philosophy and contests it on every point. My son defended your father [Descartes]; Damaie was with him and the letters supported him. But three against one wasn’t too strong for Montmoron. He said that we could only have ideas of what had entered our minds through our senses. My son said that we could think independently of our senses: for example, we think what we think [Letter to Madame de Grignan; September 15, 1680].

Typically, Sévigné takes no personal position on the dispute concerning the Cartesian theory of innate ideas, which she faithfully reports. With her usual irony she deflates the philosophical dispute by emphasizing the entertaining (divertissement) nature of the controversy.

Sévigné not only chronicles the Cartesian controversies which characterized her social milieu; her vocabulary is saturated with Cartesian terms. “Innate ideas” (idées innées) echo Descartes’s epistemology; “whirlwinds” (tourbillons) Descartes’s physics; “animal spirits” (esprits d’animaux )Descartes’s biology; “brain traces” (traces dans le cerveau) Descartes’s philosophy of mind. Sévigné’s allegiance to Cartesianism is at best ambiguous.  Her references to her daughter’s passion for Descartes are often ironic. Her philosophy of nature and of religion opposes central Cartesian theories.

A lifelong reader of philosophical works, Sévigné acquired a first-hand grasp of the philosophical controversies of the period through reading the most influential French philosophical authors of the day. Her correspondence alludes to Descartes’s Discourse of Method, Meditations, and Passions of the Soul; Malebranche’s Christian Conversations; and Pascal’s Provincial Letters and Pensées.  But her favored philosophical author was Pierre Nicole (1625-95), a priest closely associated with the Jansenist movement. During Sévigné’s lifetime, Nicole was best known as a moralist for his popular series of Essais morales (1671-78). In twenty-first century philosophy he is best known as the co-author of The Logic of Port-Royal (1662).

It is his presentation of the virtues essential for the Christian life that attracts Sévigné to Nicole. His concept of the virtue of detachment is especially helpful for the acquisition of personal peace.

I find your [Madame de Grignan’s] reflection very good and very right concerning the indifference he [Nicole] wants us to have concerning the approval or disapproval of our neighbors. Like you, I think this requires a little grace and that philosophy alone cannot bring it about. He places peace and union with our neighbor on such a high level and counsels us to acquire this at the expense of so many other things that there is no way after all this that we could be anything but indifferent as to what others think of us [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 4, 1671].

This detachment from self-concern is the fruit of an austere charity which seeks nothing but the service of one’s esteemed neighbor. In a typically Jansenist note, this peaceful self-possession can only come about through the operation of grace; reliance on philosophical reason alone inevitably falls short.

Another Jansenist trait of Nicole’s theory of virtue lies in his unmasking of natural moral virtues as covers for vice. The declared love of truth in violent philosophical disputes barely conceals the pride and willfulness of the disputants. “What he [Nicole] says about the pride and self-love one finds in all the disputes, which one covers up with the fine name of love of truth, is a point which overwhelms me” [Letter to Madame de Grignan; November 4, 1671]. Rooted in complete submission to the divine will, only the theological virtues can lead the human subject to an authentic moral life. The natural virtues defended by philosophers in their ardent disputes are often little more than the expression of self-interest and self-love.

4. Reception and Interpretation

From the time of the first publication of Madame de Sévigné’s works in the eighteenth century, the reception of her writings has been primarily literary. Literary critics have long analyzed the limpid prose style of Sévigné with its distinctive mix of naturel with vivacité. More historical critics have studied how the letters of Sévigné reflect the society of her time, especially the aristocratic subculture of the salon. Historians have paid special attention to Sévigné’s detailed chronicle of the trial of Fouquet; it constitutes one of the most detailed descriptions of judicial procedure in early modern literature. Sévigné has proved especially influential in subsequent generations of women authors. George Eliot, Elizabeth Gaskell, and Virginia Woolf praised Sévigné as a pioneer of the writing woman.

Twenty-first century commentators have developed a more philosophical analysis of Sévigné’s thought. Lyons in 2011 explores in what sense Sévigné can be classified as a philosophe; Reguig-Naya in 2002 studies the specific link between Sévigné and Descartes and Cartesianism. Several commentators interpret Sévigné’s philosophy from a gendered perspective. Montfort in 2008 employs a feminist angle; Longino Farrell in 1991 uses the category of maternal thinking. Other studies analyze Sévigné’s epistemology (Racevskis, 2002), moral theory (Cartmill, 2001), philosophy of language (Allentuch, 2008), and concept of imagination (Lyons, 2005). Sévigné’s philosophy of nature and theology invite further research.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Sévigné, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, marquise de. Correspondance, 3 vols.,ed Roger Duchêne.  Paris: Gallimard, 1972-78.
    • Duchêne’s magisterial critical edition of Sévigné’s correspondence has become the edition of reference for scholars.
  • Sévigné, Marie de Rabutin-Chantal, marquise de. Selected Letters, trans. and ed. Leonard Tancock. London: Penguin Books, 1982.
    • Tancock’s popular translation of Sévigné’s letters provides a useful guide to the principal persons cited by Sévigné and who serve as her correspondents.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Allentuch, Harriet R. “Setting Feelings to Words: Language and Emotion in the Letters of Madame de Sévigné,” in Literature Criticism from 1400 to 1800, Vol. 140, eds. T. Schoenberg and L. Trudeau.  Farmington Hills, MI: Thomson Gale, 2008: 205-225.
    • The article explores the link between emotion and linguistic expression in the correspondence.
  • Bernet, Anne. Madame de Sévigné, Mère Passion. Paris: Perrin, 1996.
    • The biography examines the relationship between Sévigné’s personal emotions and her theory of the passions.
  • Cartmill, Constance. “Madame de Sévigné et les maximes du marriage,” Dalhousie French Studies 2001 Fall; 56: 98-107.
    • The article explores the moral positions defended by Sévigné in her counsels on marriage.
  • Duchêne, Roger. Madame de Sévigné, ou, La chance d’être femme. Paris: Fayard, 1982.
    • The book uses a gendered perspective to present the biography of Sévigné.
  • Duchêne, Roger. Naissances d’un écrivain: Madame de Sévigné. Paris: Fayard, 1996.
    • The biography underlines the central stages in the development of Sévigné’s writing.
  • Farrell, Michèle Longino. Performing Motherhood: The Sévigné Correspondence. Hanover, NH: University Press of New England, 1991.
    • This biography explores the various maternal poses adopted by Sévigné in her dealings with her daughter.
  • Lyons, John D. Before Imagination and Embodied Thought from Montaigne to Rousseau. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2005: 122-147.
    • The book’s chapter on Sévigné explores how she used the imagination to deal with various experiences of loss and grief.
  • Lyons, John D. “The Marquise de Sévigné: Philosophe,” in Teaching Seventeenth and Eighteenth-Century Women Writers, ed. Faith Beasely. New York, NY: Modern Language Association of America, 2011: 178-187.
    • The article examines the various ways in which Sévigné can be considered a philosophe.
  • Montfort, Catherine R. “Mme de Sévigné: Seventeenth-Century Feminist?” in Literature Criticism from 1400 to 1800, vol. 140, eds. T. Schoenberg and L. Trudeau. Farmington Hills, MI: Thomson Gale: 114-132.
    • The book chapter approaches Sévigné’s writing from a feminist perspective.
  • Racevskis, Richard. “Time and Ways of Knowing under Louis XIV: Molière, Sévigné, Lafayette,” in Bucknell Studies in Eighteenth-Century Literature and Culture. Lewisburg, PA: Bucknell University Press, 2003: 76-84.
    • The book chapter compares Sévigné’s epistemology with that of her artistic contemporaries.
  • Reguig-Naya, Delphine. “Descartes à la lettre: poétique épistolaire et philosophie mondaine chez Mme de Sévigné,” in Dix-septième siècle 2002: no. 216: 152-171.
    • The article offers a careful analysis of the various ways Cartesian concepts and terms penetrate Sévigné’s vocabulary.


Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University Maryland
U. S. A.

Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot, Baronne de Chantal (1572—1641)

photo of de ChantalCanonized a Catholic saint in 1767, Jeanne de Chantal (Jane of Chantal) has rarely been the object of philosophical analysis.  Until recently, her influence has largely confined itself to the Visitation order she founded and to the network of schools sponsored by the Visitation nuns.  Contemporary theologians, however, have studied her works from the perspective of spirituality. Her extensive writings provide an elaborate map of the soul's journey toward perfection; they also indicate the charismatic authority of women in the ministry of spiritual direction and moral counsel during the era.  De Chantal’s lectures, conferences, and letters merit philosophical attention inasmuch as they constitute an early modern chapter in moral psychology.  Their ascetical concept of moral virtue and their mystical account of the soul reflect a theory of human nature embedded in the convent culture of the Counter-Reformation in France.  Destined for a convent audience, her commentaries on the writings of Saint Augustine constitute a gendered Augustinianism adapted to the needs of an exclusively female public.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Theological Philosophy
    1. Virtue Theory
    2. Nature and Will
    3. Divine Attributes
    4. Augustinianism
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on January 23, 1572 in Dijon, Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot belonged to a prominent Burgundian family of lawyers.  Her father, Bénigne Frémyot, was the president of the Parliament of Burgundy and a leader of the royalist party.  Her mother, Marguerite de Berbisey, a descendant of the family of St. Bernard of Clairvaux, died when Jeanne-Françoise was only eighteen months old.  Her widowed father then married Claire Jousset, who is believed to have died shortly after the marriage.

Educated at home, Jeanne-Françoise studied reading, writing, music, and dancing.  She excelled in embroidery; throughout her life she would be renowned for her needlework.  Her father personally supervised her study of history, morals, and religion.

On December 29, 1592, Jeanne-Françoise married Christophe II de Rabutin, baron de Chantal.  Residing at his ancestral castle of Bourbilly, Madame de Chantal soon revealed her skill as an administrator by reforming the economics and work habits of the dilapidated estate.  She also gained a saintly reputation for her work among the sick and the poor, especially during the region’s times of famine.  She bore six children, three of whom survived into adulthood: Celse-Bégnine (1596-1633), Marie-Aimée (1598-1617), and Françoise (1599-1684).  Her husband died as the result of a hunting accident in 1601.  During her prolonged period of mourning, Madame de Chantal made a private vow to God that she would remain celibate during the remainder of her life and that, once her children were sufficiently old, she would devote herself to works of charity.

In 1604, De Chantal’s spiritual life reached a turning point.  She met François de Sales, the bishop of Geneva who was living in exile in Annecy, due to Calvinist opposition. He delivered a series of Lenten sermons in Dijon.  Agreeing to serve as her spiritual director, De Sales introduced the widow to his own spirituality, most notably expressed in his Introduction to the Devout Life.  He also introduced her to his more philosophical works.  Drawing from Thomas Aquinas and Teresa of Avila, his Treatise on the Love of God provided an extensive Augustinian presentation of God’s attributes, the nature of the soul, and the virtues essential for the ascetical and mystical life.  In their correspondence De Sales shared with De Chantal extracts from the treatise in progress.

In 1610, believing that she was free to leave her adolescent children in the care of others, De Chantal left her home to join François de Sales in Annecy.  Her eldest child, Celeste-Bégnine, the future father of Madame de Sévigné, would long resent what he considered an unjustified abandonment.  In the same year, she founded a new female religious order, the Visitation of Holy Mary, with De Sales.  The new order was to differ from current religious orders in several details.  The nuns were not to be cloistered.  They would make simple rather than solemn vows.  They would wear the simple clothes of the poor rather than religious habits.  They would regularly leave the convent to minister to the poor, the sick, and the elderly in their homes.  The order’s rule of life would be comparatively gentle, proper for candidates for the convent who might be elderly or suffer from physical disabilities.  The order quickly grew from its original foundation in Annecy, but it underwent a crisis in 1615 when the Archbishop of Lyons insisted that the order adopt a constitution, which would impose strict cloister on the nuns.  De Chantal and De Sales protested since such restriction would destroy the announced apostolate of the order.  However, in 1618, with Pope Urban VIII supporting the demand for cloister, the co-founders acquiesced.  By the time of De Sales’s death in 1622, the order had thirteen houses. By the time of De Chantal’s death, it would count eighty-six.

From her headquarters in Annecy, De Chantal directed the order as its superior general.  Besides frequent visitations to the order’s daughter houses, she maintained an extensive correspondence with her fellow nuns, benefactors, and laypeople seeking spiritual direction.  Copied in manuscript form, her frequent lectures and conferences at Annecy were widely circulated among Visitation convents and other religious communities.  During her lifetime she acquired a reputation for sanctity, although she often confided in her more intimate writings that she suffered from spiritual aridity and desolation during the decade preceding her death.

Her letters and addresses indicate the philosophical and theological culture she had developed, especially under the tutelage of De Sales.  The works of De Sales constitute the most cited theological and philosophical sources.  Among patristic authors, she often quotes St. Augustine and St. Jerome.  She has a pronounced interest in the ascetical and mystical writers of the Spanish Counter-Reformation: Teresa of Ávila, Alphonsus Rodríguez, and Álvarez de Paz.  Her virtue theory is clearly influenced by these authors.  Other women authors cited by De Chantal include Catherine of Siena and Madame Acarie, the founder of the reformed French Carmelites.

Madame de Chantal died on December 13, 1641.  The Catholic Church beatified her in 1751 and canonized her a saint in 1767.

2. Works

The works of Jeanne de Chantal are exclusively religious in focus.  Several hundred letters from her extensive correspondence have survived.  She also wrote a long memorandum for the canonization process of François de Sales, Deposition for the Process of Beatification of St François de Sales and Responses Concerning Rules, Constitutions, and Customs, in which the superior general offered her interpretation of disputed points concerning the Visitation order’s charism and regulations.  Many of the works of De Chantal were originally oral in nature.  Visitation nuns transcribed her many addresses to nuns. These addresses included exhortations on spiritual topics such as the Rule of Saint Augustine, liturgical feasts, and occasional topics. More informal conferences, in which De Chantal answered questions posed by the nuns in assembly were also transcribed, as well as instructions given to novices at the very beginning of their convent life.  The written transcriptions of these addresses should be treated with caution, since De Chantal’s actual words are often altered by the taste and perspective of the particular amanuensis.  These addresses are of special philosophical interest because in these works De Chantal gives her most detailed theory of the virtues, of the nature of the soul, and of the divine attributes.  The Visitation nuns circulated manuscript copies of these writings among the Visitation convents.  Many of the original manuscripts remain in the archives at the Visitation motherhouse in Annecy.

During the lifetime of De Chantal, print versions of her works were already circulating.  De Chantal objected to some of these publications since she wanted to confine most of her writings to circulation within the order.  Shortly after her death, hagiographic biographies of the foundress circulated alongside the print versions of her writings.  The 1751 beatification and 1767 canonization stimulated new interested in writings by and about De Chantal.

In the nineteenth century, the Visitation nuns at Annecy published the collected works of Madame de Chantal in Ste Jeanne Françoise Frémyot de Chantal, Sa vie et ses oeuvres (1874-1879.)  The Visitation scholar Patricia Burns has recently published a critical edition of De Chantal’s letters in Jeanne-Françoise Frémyot de Chantal, Correspondance (1986-1996).  The Visitation nuns have also been largely responsible for the English translation of the works of De Chantal.  The Visitation convent of Harrow published Selected Letters of Saint Jane Frances de Chantal (1918). The Visitation convent of Bristol provided the translation for Saint Jane Frances Frémyot de Chantal, Exhortations, Conferences and Instructions (1929).  The Visitation scholar Péronne Marie Thibert translated De Chantal’s letters for Francis de Sales and Jane de Chantal, Letters of Spiritual Direction (1988).

3. Theological Philosophy

The philosophical arguments of De Chantal are embedded in a specific theological project: the guidance of nuns and laywomen toward perfection in Christ in the communion of the Catholic Church.  The virtues defended by De Chantal are distinctively Christian with a strong monastic coloration.  The analysis of the will emerges in the context of exhortations concerning the will’s perilous ascent toward union with God. Other faculties of the soul are studied through their relationship to the practice of prayer.  The moral theory and philosophical psychology of De Chantal are situated in a context which has the convent as its primary audience and pedagogical concern.

a. Virtue Theory

In De Chantal’s works the standard moral virtues receive comparatively little attention.  The discussions of temperance, fortitude, and justice are spare and indirect.  De Chantal instead emphasizes virtues with a clear theological, indeed monastic, color: charity, humility, abnegation, and abandonment to the divine will.  The moral habits prized by De Chantal reflect the distinctive culture of the convent, of the Visitation order with its stress on ascetical moderation, and of the Counter-Reformation with its mystical narrative of the soul in gradual ascent toward ecstatic union with God.

Humility constitutes the cornerstone of the edifice of virtue.  More than simple meekness, humility entails a recognition of one’s utter dependence upon God for existence and salvation.  “Humility of heart is nothing else than the genuine knowledge that we are nothing and that we can do nothing.  It is desiring with a true desire that others should hold and treat us as such.  What is called humility of heart makes us always annihilate ourselves in everything, without exception, and makes us consider ourselves always better treated and esteemed than we deserve” [Conference no. 40].  The emphasis on the annihilation of self as a psychological sign of true humility is typical of the era’s école française of spirituality, with its characteristic emphasis on annihilation (anéantissement) of personal desire as one of the signs of true union with God.

Humility enjoys a certain primacy among the virtues because it alone can perfect the internal life of the soul.  Once humility has been acquired, the moral agent’s other internal dispositions and even external actions will find their proper place.  “We do not apply ourselves to the true and solid interior virtues.  We apply ourselves too much to the exterior.  I do not mean to say that we should not practice and esteem the latter, but the interior ones are more precious to us.  We owe our chief concern and fidelity to the acquisition of these, because they are more in conformity with our vocation and because the inward virtues bring about the exterior ones…..If our spirit were very humble and brought low, all our actions, all our words, and all our exterior would also be this way” [Exhortation no. 3.6].  Without the foundation of humility, the ensemble of a moral agent’s other virtues and the expression of these virtues through external acts would suffer an inevitable distortion.

While central to the moral life, the virtue of humility is acquired only with great difficulty.  This difficulty springs from the disordered attachments that routinely enslave the moral subject.  “There are three things we rid ourselves of only with difficulty.  The first is honor, love, and self-esteem.  The second is love of our bodies and their comforts.  The third is the hatred we have for inward and outward submission … True humility tends to the contempt of this self-esteem and makes us love to be considered poor, ignorant, little, and imperfect, and to be forgotten by all creatures” [Conference no. 17] .  The triumph of humility in the soul destroys attachments to corporeal goods, social acclaim, and willfulness, which prevent the soul from attaining authentic happiness.

The social expression of this humility in the life of the nun entails a certain egalitarianism.  In dealing with either social superiors or peers, the humble nun exhibits a frank honesty that excludes flattery or condescension.  “If we were sent to the parlor to speak with princes or princesses, we should not need to think about what we should say to them nor try to compose a speech.  We should just tell them simply and without artifice what Our Lord might say to us, keeping ourselves humbly and faithful attentive to Him.  Similarly, we should be very simple, cordial, and unpretentious in dealing with our sisters.  We should respect and love them dearly, whether they be our superiors, equals, or inferiors.  We should prefer them all to ourselves and prefer ourselves to no one” [Exhortation no. 4.17].  Based upon a refusal of one’s claim to social superiority, humility levels social distinctions among the laity and among the members of religious orders.

The model and source of this humility is Christological.  It is Jesus himself who constitutes the perfect mirror of the humility the nun must cultivate.  “How did that gentle Lord not abase Himself in honor? ... He reduced Himself to such an extremity on that point that He suffered like any other mortal creature … From all powerful He appears all powerless; from all great, all little; from all terrible, all gentle and kind, allowing Himself to be guided like a tiny lamb; from all rich with the eternal riches of the Father of light, of Whom He is by nature the Eternal Son, He is become all poor among mortals, born in an obscure stable, and has only what He barely needs” [Exhortation no. 4.3].  The paradoxes of the Incarnation, especially the self-emptying of Christ as he takes flesh, illustrate humility in its purest possible form.  Christ not only provides the model for humility, through grace, he infuses and strengthens the virtue within the pious moral subject.

Allied to humility is the virtue of simplicity.  In the life of the nun, the vow of poverty permits her to give tangible external expression to the internal disposition of simplicity.  Conventual simplicity involves both physical and spiritual renunciation.  “Poverty of spirit is a detachment from all created things, if we possess them.  This poverty of spirit requires us not to set our affections on them, so that we must be poor in affection and will concerning these things and have our heart detached and completely free … Another kind of poverty is to leave them for the love of God in order to serve Him more perfectly.  We must leave them in affection and not only in fact.  True and perfect poverty of spirit is to have nothing but God in our mind” [Conference no. 28].  The simplicity and poverty defended here have a contemplative end inasmuch as they free the moral subject to focus her attention on God alone.

In De Chantal’s writings, obedience ranks as one of the essential virtues, especially for the nun who has pronounced a vow of obedience to her superior.  De Chantal’s high esteem for obedience is rooted in her hierarchical vision of the cosmos, of the political order, and of the church.  “God, by His supreme wisdom, has arranged has arranged the order of the universe in the following way: He has made all creatures submissive and dependent on each other.  The whole universal Church obeys the Sovereign Pontiff as the Vicar of our Lord Jesus Christ; each part of this Divine Spouse has a head, a bishop, whom it obeys.  Moreover, all the religious orders have superior on which each subject depends.  All private families have a father to direct and govern the family.  I am not speaking here about political obedience and subjection.  That would concern kings, princes, governors, and how soldiers obey their captains and how the entire body of an army obeys its general―they often show such an exact obedience that they shame us before God― I am only speaking to you now to make you understand that we are appointed to obey.  We must do so in an exact following of the will of God, Who is the only end of the submission of our wills” [Conference no. 5.14].  In De Chantal’s perspective, the entire universe represents an elaborate hierarchy of command and submission ordained by God.  The political and religious orders of human society imitate and participate in this hierarchy.  The virtue of obedience involves the decision of the moral agent to respect these various hierarchies through the inclination of one’s personal will. In its purest form, that of the religious vow of obedience, obedience is the surrender of one’s will to the direction of one’s legitimate superior.

The virtue of obedience in religious life presupposes one’s obedience to the moral law, as interpreted by the church.  The nub of the virtue of obedience in cloistered life is one’s complete indifference at the hands of one’s superior.  This obedience reflects a personal spiritual freedom.  “We should be ready to accomplish obedience, as many times as it shall be pleased to send us to any place and under any pretext, without any excuse.  Some say they would prefer not to be sent to small towns under the apparently good pretext that they would have less spiritual help there or that they would be more exposed to danger in times of war or other similar excuses.  If these people would examine themselves carefully and see themselves as they really are, they will find that their position is nothing but the fruit of pride, a pride so covered by these apparently good pretexts that they are blinded and do not even know the truth about themselves” [Exhortation no. 3.4].  The reasons given to refuse commands of religious obedience are only rationalizations born out of the moral subject’s desire for comfort and fear of suffering.  Authentic obedience joins docility with indifference in the presence of a morally valid command from one’s superior.

Throughout her works, De Chantal stresses charity as the highest theological virtue.  If humility is the foundation of the moral life, charity constitutes its summit.  As with the other virtues, the monastic practice of charity possesses a note of detachment.  “Thanks to God’s goodness, I have no particular like or dislike for any of my sisters.  I love those who are good because God dwells them; I love those who are not so good because God wills that I should practice the holy virtue of charity.  Those who do best give me the most consolation; those who do not do will afflict my heart.  Still, my soul and my mind love all of them and I will spend and be spent in aiding, serving, and helping them” [Exhortation no. 4.13].  The affective indifference toward the different nuns as well as the fundamental virtue of charity is presented as the fruit of divine grace.

De Chantal not only privileges the theological virtues in her account of moral virtue, she often transforms ordinary moral virtues by redefining them in a monastic context.  Her treatment of patience is typical.  Patience emerges as a virtue central for the endurance of the seasons of spiritual aridity, which are inevitable in a serious life of contemplative prayer.  “We must live in the present moment, without forecast and without worry about ourselves, concerning either the future or the present.  We should do things just as they present themselves to us.  We should profit by everything in good faith and without any other concern than that of pleasing God, by the means supplied by our vocation alone and without searching for some external resources” [Conference no. 35].  An ascetical virtue, patience permits the contemplative to focus on one’s present duties and not be distracted by memories of a past where God’s consolations were more palpable or in a desired future where God’s graces would be more tangible.

Not all moral virtues are capable of such a theological transformation.  According to De Chantal, even some of the cardinal virtues oppose the proper moral formation of the Christian and nun.  Prudence, for example, often allies itself with self-love and thus prevents the exercise of charity.  “Self-love leads to the loss of everything in the spiritual life, because it brings forth its own seeking, which hinders us from seeking God and His good pleasure.  Human prudence also does much harm; as long as we nourish this false prudence, this human spirit will act in us … It will be difficult to overcome these two enemies, for they are dexterous and deal their blows with such subtlety that very often we are not aware of them until they have done their part” [Exhortation no. 3.3].  Rather than crowning the philosophical ensemble of natural moral virtues, the constellation of theological virtues defended by De Chantal provides an alternative set of moral habits to be cultivated by the human subject in the quest of a happiness tied to salvation.

Another obstacle to the cultivation of authentic virtue is the empire of passions upon the human soul.  De Chantal rejects the theory that some ascetical exercise or mystical experience could permanently extinguish the passions. Those who claim to live in such an emotion-free state are suffering from a serious spiritual illusion.  When the passions break out in the soul, the virtuous Christian must learn how to carefully negotiate a gradual calming of the emotions.  Violent efforts to oppose one’s passions will only result in failure.  “Here is a little model of what we are to do when, rowing peacefully in our little boat, we feel, without thinking about it,  all our passions arise and cause a great storm in us, as if they would overwhelm us and drag us after them.  We must not wish to calm this tempest ourselves, but we must gently draw near the shore, keeping our will firmly in God, and coast along the small waves, to reach, through humble self-knowledge, God, who is our sure port.  Let us go along gently, without effort and without yielding to our passions anything they wish.  By so doing, we will arrive later in that divine port with more glory than if we had enjoyed a perfect calm and had steered our boat without any difficulty” [Conference no. 6].  The passions constitute an essential part of human nature; any effort to deny their power rests on an illusion concerning the affective dimension of the human subject.  Providentially, God’s tolerance of the many unexpected eruptions of passion permits the virtuous Christian to recognize one’s finitude and to acknowledge the limits of the power of one’s will.

b. Nature and Will

De Chantal’s philosophy of human nature focuses primarily upon the faculty of the will.  Distorted by original sin and concupiscence, human nature must undergo a reformation if it is to achieve its proper fulfillment in union with God.  It is in abandonment to divine providence that the human will, often disfigured by self-love, finds its proper happiness.

Conventual life is a paradigm of how sinful nature must be transformed into a nature redeemed by grace.  This overcoming of self-loving human nature constitutes the purpose of the vowed life in community.  “We have not come within these walls to live according to nature; we are taught from the commencement that we must overcome it.  We must then do this with generosity and, instead of following self-love and the human spirit, live by a holy strength of the mind, according to the lights of grace and reason.  These two lights, properly followed, are enough for leading the soul to the highest perfection of divine love” [Exhortation no. 3.3].  Properly sanctified, human nature emerges at the end of a spiritual itinerary of conversion, not at its origin.  The insistence on the complementarity of reason and grace reflects the characteristic moderation of De Chantal’s theological positions.

The requisite conversion of nature requires a certain violence to oneself.  Vices can be eradicated and virtues cultivated only at the price of this internal spiritual combat.  “I tell you often that heaven suffers violence and that the conquerors and the strong carry it way.  He who will go on to perfection must renounce himself and carry his cross.  All these are words uttered by the Eternal Truth … We have love of God to the degree we mortify ourselves and earnestly subject our nature … We shall never truly please God except by destroying our nature.  We shall never enjoy interior peace unless we practice mortification and the entire renunciation of our interior inclinations” [Exhortation no. 4.14].  This ascetical anthropology conceives human nature as a nature to be morally purified and strengthened both by grace and by ascetical measures.  Rather than being a metaphysical given, human nature is to be resisted, transformed, and molded in an itinerary of strenuous personal reformation.

One of the prerequisites for this ascetical transformation is authentic self-knowledge.  Allied to the virtue of humility, accurate self-knowledge acknowledges one’s moral misery in the state of sin.  “We must really know ourselves, our nothingness, our meanness, and our vileness.  If our understanding is filled with this truth, we shall see clearly that there are many defects, imperfections, and many things to reform in us.  In truth, we are full of wretchedness and poverty” [Conference no. 1].  The self-knowledge prized here is the frank recognition of one’s morally depraved state.

The acquisition of such self-knowledge is difficult.  All too often human efforts at introspection are biased by self-love; it is only through divine grace that the human subject can make a realistic appraisal of his or her morally perilous state.  “There is a vast difference between looking at ourselves in God’s sight and looking at ourselves in our own.  If we look at ourselves in God’s sight, we shall see ourselves as we really are, but if we look at ourselves in our own sight, we shall see ourselves as self-love suggests.  This love of ourselves does us great harm.  Unless we mortify it and  overthrow its favorite pursuits and interests, its vanity and good opinion of oneself, we shall not advance on our way and we shall always remain dwarfs in virtue” [Exhortation no. 4.2].

At the center of this spiritual struggle lies the human faculty of the will.  The will’s intentions largely determine whether a particular soul will overcome its sinfulness and truly adhere to God through a process of purification.  In a virtuous soul, the desire to do God’s will should be the only motive in one’s conduct, regardless of emotional or economic circumstances.  “Solid virtue consists in attaching ourselves only to God, in wishing for God alone, in seeking God alone, and in depending on God alone, in serving him constantly and with perseverance in whatever state He places us, whether we be in prosperity or adversity, in consolation or affliction, in health or in sickness, in dryness or in sweetness.  The failing to take pleasure in the good actions we do takes away neither the power of doing them nor the merit of them.  On the contrary, they are more agreeable to God when there is less of us in them, because we are acting more purely for Him” [Conference no. 26].  It is in the subservience of the human will to the divine will that authentic union of the soul with God emerges.

The summit of this voluntaristic union with God lies in the act of spiritual abandonment.  The human agent abandons his or her will into the divine will. The moral life becomes the effort to permit the divine will to direct one’s actions as purely as possible.  “It is a true point that we find  the highest and most sublime perfection when we are entirely given over to, dependent upon, and submissive to the events of Divine Providence.  If we have indeed surrendered to this providence … it would be indifferent to us to be humbled or exalted, to be led by this hand or the other, to be in dryness, aridity, sorrow, and privation, or to be comforted by the divine unction and by the sensible enjoyment of God.  In fact, we should keep ourselves in the good hands of the great God like cloth in the hands of the tailor, who cuts it in a hundred ways for use as he pleases” [Conference no. 41]. The passage reflects the Salesian emphasis on abandonment to divine providence as the keystone of spiritual maturity and of psychological peace.  The climax of human will is in its durable immersion in the divine will.  This voluntaristic anthropology places the itinerary of the will at the center of the moral and spiritual journey of the human subject.

c. Divine Attributes

Practical in orientation, the writings of De Chantal rarely engage in speculative theology.  Several works, however, focus on the attributes of God.  De Chantal attempts to link the contemplation of the divine attributes to motivation for confidence in God in this life and to hope of possessing God in the next.

In seeking solid reasons for hoping in God’s providence, De Chantal underlines three divine attributes: omnipotence, perfect goodness, and perfect wisdom.  “You wish to know the foundations upon which we are to support our confidence in God.  Here you have three points: first, because He is all wise; second, because He is all good; third, because He is all powerful.  Consequently, He knows everything we need for our soul and body.  He is all good and goodness itself; He shows this by what He has done for us.  He is all powerful because He gives us what He sees to be necessary for us” [Instruction no. 1].  Confidence in divine providence is not based on a generic act of faith in God; it arises from a consideration of specific attributes in God, which render Him worthy of this act of trust in difficult circumstances.  Divine power, wisdom, and goodness permit the believer to understand why God, and only God, merits such a total act of faith and hope.

The divine attributes hold a particular prominence in De Chantal’s account of the faithful soul’s destiny after death.  In the beatific vision of God, the soul will contemplate the divine attributes it has only obscurely glimpsed during the laborious meditations of terrestrial life.  Divine goodness, immensity, and majesty are the particular objects of this celestial vision.  “When we shall be in possession of the glory of paradise, how great will be our astonishment on seeing the infinite goodness, the incomprehensible immensity, and the supreme majesty of God, who has lowered Himself so far as to desire the love of the creature, which is so vile and cruel!  If the soul were capable of dying, it would die at the sight of this excessive love, this immense greatness of its Creator, which has so favored it.  It would see how badly it has corresponded to this love and the wrong it did itself in being taken up with the things of life, with trifles which had the power to separate it from its God and make it lose the incomparable good of this immortal happiness and of the vision of the divine essence” [Conference no. 20].  The passage has echoes of the Augustinian theory of the ideas in the mind of God.  The infinite goodness, limitlessness, and majesty, which were perceived in an indirect and fleeting way during moments of terrestrial reflection, are now immediately grasped in the soul’s undying contemplation of the divine essence.  This beatific vision does not only contemplate God in all of the divine simplicity, it contemplates the eternal ideas that constitute God’s attributes.

d. Augustinianism

Augustinian influence suffuses the works of De Chantal.  After François de Sales, Saint Augustine is the most cited author in her writings.  Her theory of concupiscence and of divine ideas bears Augustinian traces.  Her Augustinianism emerges most clearly in her commentary on the Rule of Saint Augustine, delivered as a series of exhortations to the Visitation nuns.

The Rule of Saint Augustine is actually a compilation of documents written by Augustine of Hippo himself and by later Augustinian writers.  Saint Augustine authored Letter 211 to a community of nuns seeking to reform themselves and Sermons 355 and 356 on the life and death of clerics.  Aelred of Rievaulx composed Of the Eremitical Life in the twelfth century.  The authorship of Monastic Consortia, Rule for Clerics, and Second Rule remains uncertain.  The Rule of Saint Augustine describes the virtues of religious life but provides few detailed prescriptive laws.  When confronted by the proliferation of religious orders, the Catholic Church insisted that new orders must use one of the preexisting rules as the basis for their constitutions; many chose The Rule of Saint Augustine on account of its brevity and its flexibility.  The Visitation order chose the rule and adapted it to its own purposes.  De Chantal’s commentaries on the text transpose the rule in a gendered key by adapting it to the requirements of an exclusively female community.  Her exhortations echo the Neo-Platonism of Augustine himself by her repeated efforts to interpret physical realities in light of the spiritual realities or ideas to which they point.

Following Augustine, De Chantal designates love as the principal end and rule of religious community.  “In this Rule St. Augustine proposes to us, in the first place, the great commandment of God, and tells us that ‘God is to be loved before all things and after Him our neighbor.’  This commandment then must needs be the foundation and the basis of our perfection, for in the observance of this lies the sum of Christian and religious perfection” [Exhortation no. 1.1].  All the moral precepts of the Christian life are subsumed under the single commandment to love God and to love one’s neighbor.

Practical in orientation, De Chantal uses Augustine’s counsels on love as a criterion for an examination of conscience by the nuns.  The moral weaknesses of the community reflect the lack of fidelity to the demanding love proposed by the gospel and the Augustinian rule.  “Do we never do to our neighbor anything but what we wish should be done to ourselves?   Are we as pleased with her welfare as we are with our own?  Do we truly hide her faults? Are we indeed pliant toward all her wishes?  Have we a sense of her sorrows?  Are we very careful to console, serve, and comfort him?  No!  We commonly wish to be preferred to her; nevertheless, you see what this commandment obliges us to do” (Exhortation no. 1.1).  The Augustinian ideal of disinterested love becomes the measure by which the actions of community members are to be judged and corrected.

Addressing a convent audience, De Chantal specifies how the Augustinian norm of love is to be pursued by the nuns.  Her distinction between spiritual and natural love is gendered inasmuch as it cites personality traits traditionally associated with women rather than men.  “In a few words, St. Augustine tells us excellently how we must love our Sisters: ‘Now, there ought not to be any sensual love among us, but only spiritual love.’  This is the point: Do not love each other with natural, sensual fondness, founded on frivolous qualities, such as relationship, alliance, familiarity, correspondence, resemblance, mental sympathy, temperamental similarity, and a thousand other foolish things imagined by the human mind.  In the same way, our minds should banish such follies as natural beauty and the charms of good breeding.  We are to love our Sisters, not with a human love, not with a self-interested love, but as our holy Rule says, with ‘spiritual affection,’ with a certain interior and cordial attachment to virtue and not to other things” [Exhortation no. 1.14].  In this pursuit of spiritual love, the nuns should pay particular attention to their conduct during conversation.  Gossip and backbiting can prove particularly destructive in the conventual pursuit of a properly purified love.

At the antipodes of this spiritual love is the self-love that fosters a spiritual dishonesty.  Focusing on the specific challenges of conventual life, De Chantal describes how coyness in dealing with illness can subtly manifest this self-love.  “I want to … speak of a certain whimsicalness of self-love which creeps into some community members.  When they have something amiss, they will not tell it to their superior; someone else must tell it.  This behavior can proceed from no other cause but pride.  There is a wish to appear very generous and not to tell one’s ailment, but it must be made known.  To stand now on one foot, now on the other, to rub one’s forehead, to appear out of breath … I declare that when I see such trickiness, I will  simply avoid you.  I will let you suffer with your self-love and act as thoug