Category Archives: 18th Century European

Immanuel Kant

kant2Towards the end of his most influential work, Critique of Pure Reason(1781/1787), Kant argues that all philosophy ultimately aims at answering these three questions: “What can I know? What should I do? What may I hope?” The book appeared at the beginning of the most productive period of his career, and by the end of his life Kant had worked out systematic, revolutionary, and often profound answers to these questions.

At the foundation of Kant’s system is the doctrine of “transcendental idealism,” which emphasizes a distinction between what we can experience (the natural, observable world) and what we cannot (“supersensible” objects such as God and the soul). Kant argued that we can only have knowledge of things we can experience. Accordingly, in answer to the question, “What can I know?” Kant replies that we can know the natural, observable world, but we cannot, however, have answers to many of the deepest questions of metaphysics.

Kant’s ethics are organized around the notion of a “categorical imperative,” which is a universal ethical principle stating that one should always respect the humanity in others, and that one should only act in accordance with rules that could hold for everyone. Kant argued that the moral law is a truth of reason, and hence that all rational creatures are bound by the same moral law. Thus in answer to the question, “What should I do?” Kant replies that we should act rationally, in accordance with a universal moral law.

Kant also argued that his ethical theory requires belief in free will, God, and the immortality of the soul. Although we cannot have knowledge of these things, reflection on the moral law leads to a justified belief in them, which amounts to a kind rational faith. Thus in answer to the question, “What may I hope?” Kant replies that we may hope that our souls are immortal and that there really is a God who designed the world in accordance with principles of justice.

In addition to these three focal points, Kant also made lasting contributions to nearly all areas of philosophy. His aesthetic theory remains influential among art critics. His theory of knowledge is required reading for many branches of analytic philosophy. The cosmopolitanism behind his political theory colors discourse about globalization and international relations. And some of his scientific contributions are even considered intellectual precursors to several ideas in contemporary cosmology.

This article presents an overview of these and other of Kant’s most important philosophical contributions. It follows standard procedures for citing Kant’s works. Passages from Critique of Pure Reason are cited by reference to page numbers in both the 1781 and 1787 editions. Thus “(A805/B833)” refers to page 805 in the 1781 edition and 833 in the 1787 edition. References to the rest of Kant’s works refer to the volume and page number of the official Deutsche Akademie editions of Kant’s works. Thus “(5:162)” refers to volume 5, page 162 of those editions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Metaphysics and Epistemology
    1. Pre-Critical Thought
    2. Dogmatic Slumber, Synthetic A Priori Knowledge, and the Copernican Shift
    3. The Cognitive Faculties and Their Representations
    4. Transcendental Idealism
      1. The Ideality of Space and Time
      2. Appearances and Things in Themselves
    5. The Deduction of the Categories
    6. Theory of Experience
    7. Critique of Transcendent Metaphysics
      1. The Soul (Paralogisms of Pure Reason)
      2. The World (Antinomies of Pure Reason)
      3. God (Ideal of Pure Reason)
  3. Philosophy of Mathematics
  4. Natural Science
    1. Physics
    2. Other Scientific Contributions
  5. Moral Theory
    1. The Good Will and Duty
    2. The Categorical Imperative
    3. Postulates of Practical Reason
  6. Political Theory and Theory of Human History
    1. Human History and the Age of Enlightenment
    2. Political Theory
    3. Perpetual Peace
  7. Theory of Art and Beauty
    1. The Beautiful and the Sublime
    2. Theory of Art
    3. Relation to Moral Theory
  8. Pragmatic Anthropology
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Kant was born in 1724 in the Prussian city of Königsberg (now Kaliningrad in Russia). His parents – Johann Georg and Anna Regina – were pietists. Although they raised Kant in this tradition (an austere offshoot of Lutheranism that emphasized humility and divine grace), he does not appear ever to have been very sympathetic to this kind of religious devotion. As a youth, he attended the Collegium Fridericianum in Königsberg, after which he attended the University of Königsberg. Although he initially focused his studies on the classics, philosophy soon caught and held his attention. The rationalism of Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) and Christian Wolff (1679-1754) was most influential on him during these early years, but Kant was also introduced to Isaac Newton’s (1642-1727) writings during this time.

His mother had died in 1737, and after his father’s death in 1746 Kant left the University to work as a private tutor for several families in the countryside around the city. He returned to the University in 1754 to teach as a Privatdozent, which meant that he was paid directly by individual students, rather than by the University. He supported himself in this way until 1770. Kant published many essays and other short works during this period. He made minor scientific contributions in astronomy, physics, and earth science, and wrote philosophical treatises engaging with the Leibnizian-Wolffian traditions of the day (many of these are discussed below). Kant’s primary professional goal during this period was to eventually attain the position of Professor of Logic and Metaphysics at Königsberg. He finally succeeded in 1770 (at the age of 46) when he completed his second dissertation (the first had been published in 1755), which is now referred to as the Inaugural Dissertation.

Commentators divide Kant’s career into the “pre-critical” period before 1770 and the “critical” period after. After the publication of the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant published hardly anything for more than a decade (this period is referred to as his “silent decade”). However, this was anything but a fallow period for Kant. After discovering and being shaken by the radical skepticism of Hume’s empiricism in the early 1770s, Kant undertook a massive project to respond to Hume. He realized that this response would require a complete reorientation of the most fundamental approaches to metaphysics and epistemology. Although it took much longer than initially planned, his project came to fruition in 1781 with the publication of the first edition of Critique of Pure Reason

The 1780s would be the most productive years of Kant’s career. In addition to writing the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783) as a sort of introduction to the Critique, Kant wrote important works in ethics (Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, 1785, and Critique of Practical Reason, 1788), he applied his theoretical philosophy to Newtonian physical theory (Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, 1786), and he substantially revised the Critique of Pure Reason in 1787. Kant capped the decade with the publication of the third and final critique, Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790).

Although the products of the 1780s are the works for which Kant is best known, he continued to publish philosophical writings through the 1790s as well. Of note during this period are Religion within the Bounds of Mere Reason (1793), Towards Perpetual Peace (1795), Metaphysics of Morals (1797), and Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798). The Religion was attended with some controversy, and Kant was ultimately led to promise the King of Prussia (Friedrich Wilhelm II) not to publish anything else on religion. (Kant considered the promise null and void after the king died in 1797.) During his final years, he devoted himself to completing the critical project with one final bridge to physical science. Unfortunately, the encroaching dementia of Kant’s final years prevented him from completing this book (partial drafts are published under the title Opus Postumum).

Kant never married and there are many stories that paint him as a quirky but dour eccentric. These stories do not do him justice. He was beloved by his friends and colleagues. He was consistently generous to all those around him, including his servants. He was universally considered a lively and engaging dinner guest and (later in life) host. And he was a devoted and popular teacher throughout the five decades he spent in the classroom. Although he had hoped for a small, private ceremony, when he died in 1804, age 79, his funeral was attended by the thousands who wished to pay their respects to “the sage of Königsberg.”

2. Metaphysics and Epistemology

The most important element of Kant’s mature metaphysics and epistemology is his doctrine of transcendental idealism, which received its fullest discussion in Critique of Pure Reason (1781/87). Transcendental idealism is the thesis that the empirical world that we experience (the “phenomenal” world of “appearances”) is to be distinguished from the world of things as they are in themselves. The most significant aspect of this distinction is that while the empirical world exists in space and time, things in themselves are neither spatial nor temporal. Transcendental idealism has wide-ranging consequences. On the positive side, Kant takes transcendental idealism to entail an “empirical realism,” according to which humans have direct epistemic access to the natural, physical world and can even have a priori cognition of basic features of all possible experienceable objects. On the negative side, Kant argues that we cannot have knowledge of things in themselves. Further, since traditional metaphysics deals with things in themselves, answers to the questions of traditional metaphysics (for example, regarding God or free will) can never be answered by human minds.

This section addresses the development of Kant’s metaphysics and epistemology and then summarizes the most important arguments and conclusions of Kant’s theory.

a. Pre-Critical Thought

Critique of Pure Reason, the book that would alter the course of western philosophy, was written by a man already far into his career. Unlike the later “critical period” Kant, the philosophical output of the early Kant was fully enmeshed in the German rationalist tradition, which was dominated at the time by the writings of Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) and Christian Wolff (1679-1754). Nevertheless, many of Kant’s concerns during the pre-critical period anticipate important aspects of his mature thought.

Kant’s first purely philosophical work was the New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition (1755). The first parts of this long essay present criticisms and revisions of the Wolffian understanding of the basic principles of metaphysics, especially the Principles of Identity (whatever is, is, and whatever is not, is not), of Contradiction (nothing can both be and not be), and of Sufficient Reason (nothing is true without a reason why it is true). In the final part, Kant defends two original principles of metaphysics. According to the “Principle of Succession,” all change in objects requires the mutual interaction of a plurality of substances. This principle is a metaphysical analogue of Newton’s principle of action and reaction, and it anticipates Kant’s argument in the Third Analogy of Experience from Critique of Pure Reason (see 2f below). According to the “Principle of Coexistence,” multiple substances can only be said to coexist within the same world if the unity of that world is grounded in the intellect of God. Although Kant would later claim that we can never have metaphysical cognition of this sort of relation between God and the world (not least of all because we can’t even know that God exists), he would nonetheless continue to be occupied with the question of how multiple distinct substances can constitute a single, unified world.

In the Physical Monadology (1756), Kant attempts to provide a metaphysical account of the basic constitution of material substance in terms of “monads.” Leibniz and Wolff had held that monads are the simple, atomic substances that constitute matter. Kant follows Wolff in rejecting Leibniz’s claim that monads are mindlike and that they do not interact with each other. The novel aspect of Kant’s account lies in his claim that each monad possesses a degree of both attractive and repulsive force, and that monads fill determinate volumes of space because of the interactions between these monads as they compress each other through their opposed repulsive forces. Thirty years later, in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786), Kant would develop the theory that matter must be understood in terms of interacting attractive and repulsive forces. The primary difference between the later view and the earlier is that Kant no longer appeals to monads, or simple substances at all (transcendental idealism rules out the possibility of simplest substances as constituents of matter; see 2gii below).

The final publication of Kant’s pre-critical period was On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World, also referred to as the Inaugural Dissertation (1770), since it marked Kant’s appointment as Königsberg’s Professor of Logic and Metaphysics. Although Kant had not yet had the final crucial insights that would lead to the development of transcendental idealism, many of the important elements of his mature metaphysics are prefigured here. Two aspects of the Inaugural Dissertation are especially worth noting. First, in a break from his predecessors, Kant distinguishes two fundamental faculties of the mind: sensibility, which represents the world through singular “intuitions,” and understanding, which represents the world through general “concepts.” In the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant argues that sensibility represents the sensible world of “phenomena” while the understanding represents an intelligible world of “noumena.” The critical period Kant will deny that we can have any determinate knowledge of noumena, and that knowledge of phenomena requires the cooperation of sensibility and understanding together. Second, in describing the “form” of the sensible world, Kant argues that space and time are “not something objective and real,” but are rather “subjective and ideal” (2:403). The claim that space and time pertain to things only as they appear, not as they are in themselves, will be one of the central theses of Kant’s mature transcendental idealism.

b. Dogmatic Slumber, Synthetic A Priori Knowledge, and the Copernican Shift

Although the early Kant showed a complete willingness to dissent from many important aspects of the Wolffian orthodoxy of the time, Kant continued to take for granted the basic rationalist assumption that metaphysical cognition was possible. In a retrospective remark from the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783), Kant says that his faith in this rationalist assumption was shaken by David Hume (1711-1776), whose skepticism regarding the possibility of knowledge of causal necessary connections awoke Kant from his “dogmatic slumber” (4:260). Hume argued that we can never have knowledge of necessary connections between causes and effects because such knowledge can neither be given through the senses, nor derived a priori as conceptual truths. Kant realized that Hume’s problem was a serious one because his skepticism about knowledge of the necessity of the connection between cause and effect generalized to all metaphysical knowledge pertaining to necessity, not just causation specifically. For instance, there is the question why mathematical truths necessarily hold true in the natural world, or the question whether we can know that a being (God) exists necessarily.

The solution to Hume’s skepticism, which would form the basis of the critical philosophy, was twofold. The first part of Kant’s solution was to agree with Hume that metaphysical knowledge (such as knowledge of causation) is neither given through the senses, nor is it known a priori through conceptual analysis. Kant argued, however, that there is a third kind of knowledge which is a priori, yet which is not known simply by analyzing concepts. He referred to this as “synthetic a priori knowledge.” Where analytic judgments are justified by the semantic relations between the concepts they mention (for example, “all bachelors are unmarried”), synthetic judgments are justified by their conformity to the given object that they describe (for example, “this ball right here is red”). The puzzle posed by the notion of synthetic a priori knowledge is that it would require that an object be presented to the mind, but not be given in sensory experience.

The second part of Kant’s solution is to explain how synthetic a priori knowledge could be possible. He describes his key insight on this matter as a “Copernican” shift in his thinking about the epistemic relation between the mind and the world. Copernicus had realized that it only appeared as though the sun and stars revolved around us, and that we could have knowledge of the way the solar system really was if we took into account the fact that the sky looks the way it does because we perceivers are moving. Analogously, Kant realized that we must reject the belief that the way things appear corresponds to the way things are in themselves. Furthermore, he argued that the objects of knowledge can only ever be things as they appear, not as they are in themselves. Appealing to this new approach to metaphysics and epistemology, Kant argued that we must investigate the most basic structures of experience (that is, the structures of the way things appear to us), because the basic structures of experience will coincide with the basic structures of any objects that could possibly be experienced. In other words, if it is only possible to have experience of an object if the object conforms to the conditions of experience, then knowing the conditions of experience will give us knowledge – synthetic a priori knowledge in fact – of every possible object of experience. Kant overcomes Hume’s skepticism by showing that we can have synthetic a priori knowledge of objects in general when we take as the object of our investigation the very form of a possible object of experience. Critique of Pure Reason is an attempt to work through all of the important details of this basic philosophical strategy.

c. The Cognitive Faculties and Their Representations

Kant’s theory of the mind is organized around an account of the mind’s powers, its “cognitive faculties.” One of Kant’s central claims is that the cognitive capacities of the mind depend on two basic and fundamentally distinct faculties. First, there is “sensibility.” Sensibility is a passive faculty because its job is to receive representations through the affection of objects on the senses. Through sensibility, objects are “given” to the mind. Second, there is “understanding,” which is an active faculty whose job is to “think” (that is, apply concepts to) the objects given through sensibility.

The most basic type of representation of sensibility is what Kant calls an “intuition.” An intuition is a representation that refers directly to a singular individual object. There are two types of intuitions. Pure intuitions are a priori representations of space and time themselves (see 2d1 below). Empirical intuitions are a posteriori representations that refer to specific empirical objects in the world. In addition to possessing a spatiotemporal “form,” empirical intuitions also involve sensation, which Kant calls the “matter” of intuition (and of experience generally). (Without sensations, the mind could never have thoughts about real things, only possible ones.) We have empirical intuitions both of objects in the physical world (“outer intuitions”) and objects in our own minds (“inner intuitions”).

The most basic type of representation of understanding is the “concept.” Unlike an intuition, a concept is a representation that refers generally to indefinitely many objects. (For instance, the concept ‘cat’ on its own could refer to any and all cats, but not to any one in particular.) Concepts refer to their objects only indirectly because they depend on intuitions for reference to particular objects. As with intuitions, there are two basic types of concepts. Pure concepts are a priori representations and they characterize the most basic logical structure of the mind. Kant calls these concepts “categories.” Empirical concepts are a posteriori representations, and they are formed on the basis of sensory experience with the world. Concepts are combined by the understanding into “judgments,” which are the smallest units of knowledge. I can only have full cognition of an object in the world once I have, first, had an empirical intuition of the object, second, conceptualized this object in some way, and third, formed my conceptualization of the intuited object into a judgment. This means that both sensibility and understanding must work in cooperation for knowledge to be possible. As Kant expresses it, “Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (A51/B75).

There are two other important cognitive faculties that must be mentioned. The first is transcendental “imagination,” which mediates between sensibility and understanding. Kant calls this faculty “blind” because we do not have introspective access to its operations. Kant says that we can at least know that it is responsible for forming intuitions in such a way that it is possible for the understanding to apply concepts to them. The other is “reason,” which operates in a way similar to the understanding, but which operates independently of the senses. While understanding combines the data of the senses into judgments, reason combines understanding’s judgments together into one coherent, unified, systematic whole. Reason is not satisfied with mere disconnected bits of knowledge. Reason wants all knowledge to form a system of knowledge. Reason is also the faculty responsible for the “illusions” of transcendent metaphysics (see 2g below).

d. Transcendental Idealism

Transcendental idealism is a theory about the relation between the mind and its objects. Three fundamental theses make up this theory: first, there is a distinction between appearances (things as they appear) and things as they are in themselves. Second, space and time are a priori, subjective conditions on the possibility of experience, and hence they pertain only to appearances, not to things in themselves. Third, we can have determinate cognition of only of things that can be experienced, hence only of appearances, not things in themselves.

A quick remark on the term “transcendental idealism” is in order. Kant typically uses the term “transcendental” when he wants to emphasize that something is a condition on the possibility of experience. So for instance, the chapter titled “Transcendental Analytic of Concepts” deals with the concepts without which cognition of an object would be impossible.  Kant uses the term “idealism” to indicate that the objects of experience are mind-dependent (although the precise sense of this mind-dependence is controversial; see 2d2 below). Hence, transcendental idealism is the theory that it is a condition on the possibility of experience that the objects of experience be in some sense mind-dependent.

i. The Ideality of Space and Time

Kant argues that space and time are a priori, subjective conditions on the possibility of experience, that is, that they are transcendentally ideal. Kant grounds the distinction between appearances and things in themselves on the realization that, as subjective conditions on experience, space and time could only characterize things as they appear, not as they are in themselves. Further, the claim that we can only know appearances (not things in themselves) is a consequence of the claims that we can only know objects that conform to the conditions of experience, and that only spatiotemporal appearances conform to these conditions. Given the systematic importance of this radical claim, what were Kant’s arguments for it? What follows are some of Kant’s most important arguments for the thesis.

One argument has to do with the relation between sensations and space. Kant argues that sensations on their own are not spatial, but that they (or arguably the objects they correspond to) are represented in space, “outside and next to one another” (A23/B34). Hence, the ability to sense objects in space presupposes the a priori representation of space, which entails that space is merely ideal, hence not a property of things in themselves.

Another argument that Kant makes repeatedly during the critical period can be called the “argument from geometry.” Its two premises are, first, that the truths of geometry are necessary truths, and thus a priori truths, and second, that the truths of geometry are synthetic (because these truths cannot be derived from an analysis of the meanings of geometrical concepts). If geometry, which is the study of the structure of space, is synthetic a priori, then its object – space – must be a mere a priori representation and not something that pertains to things in themselves. (Kant’s theory of mathematical cognition is discussed further in 3b below.)

Many commentators have found these arguments less than satisfying because they depend on the questionable assumption that if the representations of space and time are a priori they thereby cannot be properties of things in themselves. “Why can’t it be both?” many want to ask. A stronger argument appears in Kant’s discussion of the First and Second Antinomies of Pure Reason (discussed below, 2g2). There Kant argues that if space and time were things in themselves or even properties of things in themselves, then one could prove that space and time both are and are not infinitely large, and that matter in space both is and is not infinitely divisible. In other words, the assumption that space and time are transcendentally real instead of transcendentally ideal leads to a contradiction, and thus space and time must be transcendentally ideal.

ii. Appearances and Things in Themselves

How Kant’s distinction between appearances and things in themselves should be understood is one of the most controversial topics in the literature. It is a question of central importance because how one understands this distinction determines how one will understand the entire nature of Kantian idealism. The following briefly summarizes the main interpretive options, but it does not take a stand on which is correct.

According to “two-world” interpretations, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is to be understood in metaphysical and ontological terms. Appearances (and hence the entire physical world that we experience) comprise one set of entities, and things in themselves are an ontologically distinct set of entities. Although things in themselves may somehow cause us to have experience of appearances, the appearances we experience are not things in themselves.

According to “one-world” or “two-aspect” interpretations, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is to be understood in epistemological terms. Appearances are ontologically the very same things as things in themselves, and the phrase “in themselves” simply means “not considered in terms of their epistemic relation to human perceivers.”

A common objection against two-world interpretations is that they may make Kant’s theory too similar to Berkeley’s immaterialist idealism (an association from which Kant vehemently tried to distance himself), and they seem to ignore Kant’s frequent characterization of the appearance/thing in itself distinction in terms of different epistemic standpoints. And a common objection against one-world interpretations is that they may trivialize some of the otherwise revolutionary aspects of Kant’s theory, and they seem to ignore Kant’s frequent characterization of the appearance/thing in itself distinction in seemingly metaphysical terms. There have been attempts at interpretations that are intermediate between these two options. For instance, some have argued that Kant only acknowledges one world, but that the appearance/thing in itself distinction is nevertheless metaphysical, not merely epistemological.

e. The Deduction of the Categories

After establishing the ideality of space and time and the distinction between appearances and things in themselves, Kant goes on to show how it is possible to have a priori cognition of the necessary features of appearances. Cognizing appearances requires more than mere knowledge of their sensible form (space and time); it also requires that we be able to apply certain concepts (for example, the concept of causation) to appearances. Kant identifies the most basic concepts that we can use to think about objects as the “pure concepts of understanding,” or the “categories.”

There are twelve categories in total, and they fall into four groups of three:














The task of the chapter titled “Transcendental Deduction of the Categories” is to show that these categories can and must be applied in some way to any object that could possibly be an object of experience. The argument of the Transcendental Deduction is one of the most important moments in the Critique, but it is also one of the most difficult, complex, and controversial arguments in the book. Hence, it will not be possible to reconstruct the argument in any detail here. Instead, Kant’s most important claims and moves in the Deduction are described.

Kant’s argument turns on conceptions of self-consciousness (or what he calls “apperception”) as a condition on the possibility of experiencing the world as a unified whole. Kant takes it to be uncontroversial that we can be aware of our representations as our representations. It is not just that I can have the thoughts ‘P’ or ‘Q’; I am also always able to ascribe these thoughts to myself: ‘I think P’ and ‘I think Q’. Further, we are also able to recognize that it is the same I that does the thinking in both cases. Thus, we can recognize that ‘I think both P and Q’. In general, all of our experience is unified because it can be ascribed to the one and same I, and so this unity of experience depends on the unity of the self-conscious I. Kant next asks what conditions must obtain in order for this unity of self-consciousness to be possible. His answer is that we must be able to differentiate between the I that does the thinking and the object that we think about. That is, we must be able to distinguish between subjective and objective elements in our experience. If we could not make such a distinction, then all experience would just be so many disconnected mental happenings: everything would be subjective and there would be no “unity of apperception” that stands over and against the various objects represented by the I. So next Kant needs to explain how we are able to differentiate between the subjective and objective elements of experience. His answer is that a representation is objective when the subject is necessitated in representing the object in a certain way, that is, when it is not up to the free associative powers of my imagination to determine how I represent it. For instance, whether I think a painting is attractive or whether it calls to mind an instance from childhood depends on the associative activity of my own imagination; but the size of the canvas and the chemical composition of the pigments is not up to me: insofar as I represent these as objective features of the painting, I am necessitated in representing them in a certain way. In order for a representational content to be necessitated in this way, according to Kant, is for it to be subject to a “rule.” The relevant rules that Kant has in mind are the conditions something must satisfy in order for it to be represented as an object at all. And these conditions are precisely the concepts laid down in the schema of the categories, which are the concepts of an “object in general.” Hence, if I am to have experience at all, I must conceptualize objects in terms of the a priori categories.

Kant’s argument in the Deduction is a “transcendental argument”: Kant begins with a premise accepted by everyone, but then asks what conditions must have been met in order for this premise to be true. Kant assumed that we have a unified experience of the many objects populating the world. This unified experience depends on the unity of apperception. The unity of apperception enables the subject to distinguish between subjective and objective elements in experience. This ability, in turn, depends on representing objects in accordance with rules, and the rules in question are the categories. Hence, the only way we can explain the fact that we have experience at all is by appeal to the fact that the categories apply to the objects of experience.

It is worth emphasizing how truly radical the conclusion of the Transcendental Deduction is. Kant takes himself to have shown that all of nature is subject to the rules laid down by the categories. But these categories are a priori: they originate in the mind. This means that the order and regularity we encounter in the natural world is made possible by the mind’s own construction of nature and its order. Thus the conclusion of the Transcendental Deduction parallels the conclusion of the Transcendental Aesthetic: where the latter had shown that the forms of sensibility (space and time) originate in the mind and are imposed on the world, the former shows that the forms of understanding (the categories) also originate in the mind and are imposed on the world.

f. Theory of Experience

The Transcendental Deduction showed that it is necessary for us to make use of the categories in experience, but also that we are justified in making use of them. In the following series of chapters (together labeled the Analytic of Principles) Kant attempts to leverage the results of the Deduction and prove that there are transcendentally necessary laws that every possible object of experience must obey. He refers to these as “principles of pure understanding.” These principles are synthetic a priori in the sense defined above (see 2b), and they are transcendental conditions on the possibility of experience.

The first two principles correspond to the categories of quantity and quality. First, Kant argues that every object of experience must have a determinate spatial shape and size and a determinate temporal duration (except mental objects, which have no spatial determinations). Second, Kant argues that every object of experience must contain a “matter” that fills out the object’s extensive magnitude. This matter must be describable as an “intensive magnitude.” Extensive magnitudes are represented through the intuition of the object (the form of the representation) and intensive magnitudes are represented by the sensations that fill out the intuition (the matter of the representation).

The next three principles are discussed in an important, lengthy chapter called the Analogies of Experience. They derive from the relational categories: substance, causality, and community. According to the First Analogy, experience will always involve objects that must be represented as substances. “Substance” here is to be understood in terms of an object that persists permanently as a “substratum” and which is the bearer of impermanent “accidents.” According to the Second Analogy, every event must have a cause. One event is said to be the cause of another when the second event follows the first in accordance with a rule. And according to the Third Analogy (which presupposes the first two), all substances stand in relations of reciprocal interaction with each other. That is, any two pieces of material substance will effect some degree of causal influence on each other, even if they are far apart.

The principles of the Analogies of Experience are important metaphysical principles, and if Kant’s arguments for them are successful, they mark significant advances in the metaphysical investigation of nature. The First Analogy is a form of the principle of the conservation of matter: it shows that matter can never be created or annihilated by natural means, it can only be altered. The Second Analogy is a version of the principle of sufficient reason applied to experience (causes being sufficient reasons for their effects), and it represents Kant’s refutation of Hume’s skepticism regarding causation. Hume had argued that we can never have knowledge of necessary connections between events; rather, we can only perceive certain types of events to be constantly conjoined with other types of events. In arguing that events follow each other in accordance with rules, Kant has shown how we can have knowledge of necessary connections between events above and beyond their mere constant conjunction. Lastly, Kant probably intended the Third Analogy to establish a transcendental, a priori basis for something like Newton’s law of universal gravitation, which says that no matter how far apart two objects are they will exert some degree of gravitational influence on each other.

The Postulates of Empirical Thinking in General contains the final set of principles of pure understanding and they derive from the modal categories (possibility, actuality, necessity). The Postulates define the different ways to represent the modal status of objects, that is, what it is for an object of experience to be possible, actual, or necessary.

The most important passage from the Postulates chapter is the Refutation of Idealism, which is a refutation of external world skepticism that Kant added to the 1787 edition of the Critique. Kant had been annoyed by reviews of the first edition that unfavorably compared his transcendental idealism with Berkeley’s immaterialist idealism. In the Refutation, Kant argues that his system entails not just that an external (that is, spatial) world is possible (which Berkeley denied), but that we can know it is real (which Descartes and others questioned). Kant’s argumentative strategy in the Refutation is ingenious but controversial. Where the skeptics assume that we have knowledge of the states of our own minds, but say that we cannot be certain that an external world corresponds to these states, Kant turns the tables and argues that we would not have knowledge of the states of our own minds (specifically, the temporal order in which our ideas occur) if we were not simultaneously aware of permanent substances in space, outside of the mind. The precise structure of Kant’s argument, as well as the question how successful it is, continues to be a matter of heated debate in the literature.

g. Critique of Transcendent Metaphysics

One of the most important upshots of Kant’s theory of experience is that it is possible to have knowledge of the world because the world as we experience it conforms to the conditions on the possibility of experience. Accordingly, Kant holds that there can be knowledge of an object only if it is possible for that object to be given in an experience. This aspect of the epistemological condition of the human subject entails that there are important areas of inquiry about which we would like to have knowledge, but cannot. Most importantly, Kant argued that transcendent metaphysics, that is, philosophical inquiry into “supersensible” objects that are not a part of the empirical world, marks a philosophical dead end. (Note: There is a subtle but important difference between the terms “transcendental” and “transcendent” for Kant. “Transcendental” describes conditions on the possibility of experience. “Transcendent” describes unknowable objects in the “noumenal” realm of things in themselves.)

Kant calls the basic concepts of metaphysical inquiry “ideas.” Unlike concepts of the understanding, which correspond to possible objects that can be given in experience, ideas are concepts of reason, and they do not correspond to possible objects of experience. The three most important ideas with which Kant is concerned in the Transcendental Dialectic are the soul, the world (considered as a totality), and God. The peculiar thing about these ideas of reason is that reason is led by its very structure to posit objects corresponding to these ideas. It cannot help but do this because reason’s job is to unify cognitions into a systematic whole, and it finds that it needs these ideas of the soul, the world, and God, in order to complete this systematic unification. Kant refers to reason’s inescapable tendency to posit unexperienceable and hence unknowable objects corresponding to these ideas as “transcendental illusion.”

Kant presents his analysis of transcendental illusion and his critique of transcendent metaphysics in the series of chapters titled “Transcendental Dialectic,” which takes up the majority of the second half of Critique of Pure Reason. This section summarizes Kant’s most important arguments from the Dialectic.

i. The Soul (Paralogisms of Pure Reason)

Kant addresses the metaphysics of the soul – an inquiry he refers to as “rational psychology” – in the Paralogisms of Pure Reason. Rational psychology, as Kant describes it, is the attempt to prove metaphysical theses about the nature of the soul through an analysis of the simple proposition, “I think.” Many of Kant’s rationalist predecessors and contemporaries had thought that reflection on the notion of the “I” in the proposition “I think” would reveal that the I is necessarily a substance (which would mean that the I is a soul), an indivisible unity (which some would use to prove the immortality of the soul), self-identical (which is relevant to questions regarding personal identity), and distinct from the external world (which can lead to external-world skepticism). Kant argues that such reasoning is the result of transcendental illusion.

Transcendental illusion in rational psychology arises when the mere thought of the I in the proposition “I think” is mistaken for a cognition of the I as an object. (A cognition involves both intuition and concept, while a mere thought involves only concept.) For instance, consider the question whether we can cognize the I as a substance (that is, as a soul). On the one hand, something is cognized as a substance when it is represented only as the subject of predication and is never itself the predicate of some other subject. The I of “I think” is always represented as subject (the I’s various thoughts are its predicates). On the other hand, something can only be cognized as a substance when it is given as a persistent object in an intuition (see 2f above), and there can be no intuition of the I itself. Hence although we cannot help but think of the I as a substantial soul, we can never have cognition of the I as a substance, and hence knowledge of the existence and nature of the soul is impossible.

ii. The World (Antinomies of Pure Reason)

The Antinomies of Pure Reason deal with “rational cosmology,” that is, with metaphysical inquiry into the nature of the cosmos considered as a totality. An “antinomy” is a conflict of reason with itself. Antinomies arise when reason seems to be able to prove two opposed and mutually contradictory propositions with apparent certainty. Kant discusses four antinomies in the first Critique (he uncovers other antinomies in later writings as well). The First Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that the universe is both finite and infinite in space and time. The Second Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that matter both is and is not infinitely divisible into ever smaller parts. The Third Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that free will cannot be a causally efficacious part of the world (because all of nature is deterministic) and yet that it must be such a cause. And the Fourth Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that there is and there is not a necessary being (which some would identify with God).

In all four cases, Kant attempts to resolve these conflicts of reason with itself by appeal to transcendental idealism. The claim that space and time are not features of things in themselves is used to resolve the First and Second Antinomies. Since the empirical world in space and time is identified with appearances, and since the world as a totality can never itself be given as a single appearance, there is no determinate fact of the matter regarding the size of the universe: It is neither determinately finite nor determinately infinite; rather, it is indefinitely large. Similarly, matter has neither simplest atoms (or “monads”) nor is it infinitely divided; rather, it is indefinitely divisible.

The distinction between appearances and things in themselves is used to resolve the Third and Fourth Antinomies. Although every empirical event experienced within the realm of appearance has a deterministic natural cause, it is at least logically possible that freedom can be a causally efficacious power at the level of things in themselves. And although every empirical object experienced within the realm of appearance is a contingently existing entity, it is logically possible that there is a necessary being outside the realm of appearance which grounds the existence of the contingent beings within the realm of appearance. It must be kept in mind that Kant has not claimed to demonstrate the existence of a transcendent free will or a transcendent necessary being: Kant denies the possibility of knowledge of things in themselves. Instead, Kant only takes himself to have shown that the existence of such entities is logically possible. In his moral theory, however, Kant will offer an argument for the actuality of freedom (see 5c below).

iii. God (Ideal of Pure Reason)

The Ideal of Pure Reason addresses the idea of God and argues that it is impossible to prove the existence of God. The argumentation in the Ideal of Pure Reason was anticipated in Kant’s The Only Possible Argument in Support of the Existence of God (1763), making this aspect of Kant’s mature thought one of the most significant remnants of the pre-critical period.

Kant identifies the idea of God with the idea of an ens realissimum, or “most real being.” This most real being is also considered by reason to be a necessary being, that is, something which exists necessarily instead of merely contingently. Reason is led to posit the idea of such a being when it reflects on its conceptions of finite beings with limited reality and infers that the reality of finite beings must derive from and depend on the reality of the most infinitely perfect being. Of course, the fact that reason necessarily thinks of a most real, necessary being does not entail that such a being exists. Kant argues that there are only three possible arguments for the existence of such a being, and that none is successful.

According to the ontological argument for the existence of God (versions of which were proposed by St. Anselm (1033-1109) and Descartes (1596-1650), among others), God is the only being whose essence entails its existence. Kant famously objects that this argument mistakenly treats existence as a “real predicate.” According to Kant, when I make an assertion of the form “x is necessarily F,” all I can mean is that “if x exists, then x must be F.” Thus when proponents of the ontological argument claim that the idea of God entails that “God necessarily exists,” all they can mean is that “if God exists, then God exists,” which is an empty tautology.

Kant also offers lengthy criticisms of the cosmological argument (the existence of contingent beings entails the existence of a necessary being) and the physico-theological argument, which is also referred to as the “argument from design” (the order and purposiveness in the empirical world can only be explained by a divine creator). Kant argues that both of these implicitly depend on the argumentation of the ontological argument pertaining to necessary existence, and since it fails, they fail as well.

Although Kant argues in the Transcendental Dialectic that we cannot have cognition of the soul, of freedom of the will, nor of God, in his ethical writings he will complicate this story and argue that we are justified in believing in these things (see 5c below).

3. Philosophy of Mathematics

The distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments (see 2b above) is necessary for understanding Kant’s theory of mathematics. Recall that an analytic judgment is one where the truth of the judgment depends only on the relation between the concepts used in the judgment. The truth of a synthetic judgment, by contrast, requires that an object be “given” in sensibility and that the concepts used in the judgment be combined in the object. In these terms, most of Kant’s predecessors took mathematical truths to be analytic truths. Kant, by contrast argued that mathematical knowledge is synthetic. It may seem surprising that one’s knowledge of mathematical truths depends on an object being given in sensibility, for we surely don’t arrive at mathematical knowledge by empirical means. Recall, however, that a judgment can be both synthetic yet a priori. Like the judgments of the necessary structures of experience, mathematics is also synthetic a priori according to Kant.

To make this point, Kant considers the proposition ‘7+5=12’. Surely, this proposition is a priori: I can know its truth without doing empirical experiments to see what happens when I put seven things next to five other things. More to the point, ‘7+5=12’ must be a priori because it is a necessary truth, and empirical judgments are always merely contingent according to Kant. Yet at the same time, the judgment is not analytic because, “The concept of twelve is by no means already thought merely by my thinking of that unification of seven and five, and no matter how long I analyze my concept of such a possible sum I will still not find twelve in it” (B15).

If mathematical knowledge is synthetic, then it depends on objects being given in sensibility. And if it is a priori, then these objects must be non-empirical objects. What sort of objects does Kant have in mind here? The answer lies in Kant’s theory of the pure forms of intuition (space and time). Recall that an intuition is a singular, immediate representation of an individual object (see 2c above). Empirical intuitions represent sensible objects through sensation, but pure intuitions are a priori representations of space and time as such. These pure intuitions of space and time provide the objects of mathematics through what Kant calls a “construction” of concepts in pure intuition. As he puts it, “to construct a concept means to exhibit a priori the intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741). A mathematical concept (for example, ‘triangle’) can be thought of as a rule for how to make an object that corresponds to that concept. Thus if ‘triangle’ is defined as ‘three-sided, two-dimensional shape’, then I construct a triangle in pure intuition when I imagine three lines coming together to form a two-dimensional figure. These pure constructions in intuition can be used to arrive at (synthetic, a priori) mathematical knowledge. Consider the proposition, ‘The angles of a triangle sum to 180 degrees’. When I construct a triangle in intuition in accordance with the rule ‘three-sided, two-dimensional shape’, then the constructed triangle will in fact have angles that sum to 180 degrees. And this will be true irrespective of what particular triangle I constructed (isosceles, scalene, and so forth.). Kant holds that all mathematical knowledge is derived in this fashion: I take a concept, construct it in pure intuition, and then determine what features of the constructed intuition are necessarily true of it.

4. Natural Science

In addition to his work in pure theoretical philosophy, Kant displayed an active interest in the natural sciences throughout his career. Most of his important scientific contributions were in the physical sciences (including not just physics proper, but also earth sciences and cosmology). In Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) he also presented a lengthy discussion of the philosophical basis of the study of biological entities.

In general, Kant thought that a body of knowledge could only count as a science in the true sense if it could admit of mathematical description and an a priori principle that could be “presented a priori in intuition” (4:471). Hence, Kant was pessimistic about the possibility of empirical psychology ever amounting to a true science. Kant even thought it might be the case that “chemistry can be nothing more than a systematic art or experimental doctrine, but never a proper science” (4:471).

This section focuses primarily on Kant’s physics (4a), but it also lists several of Kant’s other scientific contributions (4b).

a. Physics

Kant’s interest in physical theory began early. His first published work, Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces (1749) was an inquiry into some foundational problems in physics, and it entered into the “vis viva” (“living forces”) debate between Leibniz and the Cartesians regarding how to quantify force in moving objects (for the most part, Kant sided with the Leibnizians). A few years later, Kant wrote the Physical Monadology (1756), which dealt with other foundational questions in physics (see 2a above.)

Kant’s mature physical theory is presented in its fullest form in Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786). This theory can be understood as an outgrowth and consequence of the transcendental theory of experience articulated in Critique of Pure Reason (see 2f above). Where the Critique had shown the necessary conceptual forms to which all possible objects of experience must conform, the Metaphysical Foundations specifies in greater detail what exactly the physical constitution of these objects must be like. The continuity with the theory of experience from the Critique is implicit in the very structure of the Metaphysical Foundations. Just as Kant’s theory of experience was divided into four sections corresponding to the four groups of categories (quantity, quality, relation, modality), the body of the Metaphysical Foundations is also divided along the same lines.

Like the theory of the Physical Monadology, the Metaphysical Foundations presents a “dynamical” theory of matter according to which material substance is constituted by an interaction between attractive and repulsive forces. The basic idea is that each volume of material substance possesses a brute tendency to expand and push away other volumes of substance (this is repulsive force) and each volume of substance possesses a brute tendency to contract and to attract other volumes of substance (this is attractive force). The repulsive force explains the solidity and impenetrability of bodies while the attractive force explains gravitation (and presumably also phenomena such as magnetic attraction). Further, any given volume of substance will possess these forces to a determinate degree: the matter in a volume can be more or less repulsive and more or less attractive. The ratio of attractive and repulsive force in a substance will determine how dense the body is. In this respect, Kant’s theory marks a sharp break from those of his mechanist predecessors. (Mechanists believed that all physical phenomena could be explained by appeal to the sizes, shapes, and velocities of material bodies.) The Cartesians thought that there is no true difference in density and that the appearance of differences in density could be explained by appeal to porosity in the body. Similarly, the atomists thought that density could be explained by differences in the ratio of atoms to void in any given volume. Thus for both of these theories, any time there was a volume completely filled in with material substance (no pores, no void), there could only be one possible value for mass divided by volume. According to Kant’s theory, by contrast, two volumes of equal size could be completely filled in with matter and yet differ in their quantity of matter (their mass), and hence differ in their density (mass divided by volume). Another consequence of Kant’s theory that puts him at odds with the Cartesians and atomists was his claim that matter is elastic, hence compressible: a completely filled volume of matter could be reduced in volume while the quantity of matter remained unchanged (hence it would become denser). The Cartesians and atomists took this to be impossible.

At the end of his career, Kant worked on a project that was supposed to complete the connection between the transcendental philosophy and physics. Among other things, Kant attempted to give a transcendental, a priori demonstration of the existence of a ubiquitous “ether” that permeates all of space. Although Kant never completed a manuscript for this project (due primarily to the deterioration of his mental faculties at the end of his life), he did leave behind many notes and partial drafts. Many of these notes and drafts have been edited and published under the title Opus Postumum. 

b. Other Scientific Contributions

In addition to his major contributions to physics, Kant published various writings addressing different issues in the natural sciences. Early on he showed a great deal of interest in geology and earth science, as evidenced by the titles of some of his shorter essays: The question, Whether the Earth is Ageing, Considered from a Physical Point of View (1754); On the Causes of Earthquakes on the Occasion of the Calamity that Befell the Western Countries of Europe Towards the End of Last Year (1756); Continued Observations on the Earthquakes that Have been Experienced for Some Time (1756); New Notes to Explain the Theory of the Winds, in which, at the Same Time, He Invites Attendance to his Lectures (1756).

In 1755, he wrote the Succinct Exposition of Some Meditations on Fire (which he submitted to the university as a Master’s Thesis). There he argued, against the Cartesian mechanists, that physical phenomena such as fire can only be explained by appeal to elastic (that is, compressible) matter, which anticipated the mature physics of his Metaphysical Foundations (see 4a above).

One of Kant’s most lasting scientific contributions came from his early work in cosmology. In his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), Kant gave a mechanical explanation of the formation of the solar system and the galaxies in terms of the principles of Newtonian physics. (A shorter version of the argument also appears in The Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God from 1763.) Kant’s hypothesis was that a single mechanical process could explain why we observe an orbital motion of smaller bodies around larger ones at many different scales in the cosmos (moons around planets, planets around stars, and stars around the center of the galaxy). He proposed that at the beginning of creation, all matter was spread out more or less evenly and randomly in a kind of nebula. Since the various bits of matter all attracted each other through gravitation, bodies would move towards each other within local regions to form larger bodies. The largest of these became stars, and the smaller ones became moons or planets. Because everything was already in motion (due to the gravitational attraction of everything to everything), and because all objects would be pulled towards the center of mass of their local region (for example, the sun at the center of the solar system, or a planet at the center of its own smaller planetary system), the motion of objects within that region would become orbital motions (as described by Newton’s theory of gravity). Although the Universal Natural History was not widely read for most of Kant’s lifetime (due primarily to Kant’s publisher going bankrupt while the printed books remained in a warehouse), in 1796 Pierre-Simon Laplace (1749-1827) proposed a remarkably similar version of the same theory, and this caused renewed interest in Kant’s book. Today the theory is referred to as the “Kant-Laplace Nebular Hypothesis,” and a modified version of this theory is still held today.

Finally, in the second half of Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), Kant discusses the philosophical foundations of biology by way of an analysis of teleological judgments. While in no way a fully worked out biological theory per se, Kant connects his account of biological cognition in interesting ways to other important aspects of his philosophical system. First, natural organisms are essentially teleological, or “purposive.” This purposiveness is manifested through the organic structure of the organism: its many parts all work together to constitute the whole, and any one part only makes sense in terms of its relation to the healthy functioning of the whole. For instance, the teeth of an animal are designed to chew the kind of food that the animal is equipped to hunt or forage and that it is suited to digest. In this respect, biological entities bear a strong analogy to great works of art. Great works of art are also organic insofar as the parts only make sense in the context of the whole, and art displays a purposiveness similar to that found in nature (see section 7 below). Second, Kant discusses the importance of biology with respect to theological cognition. While he denies that the apparent design behind the purposiveness of organisms can be used as a proof for God’s existence (see 2g3 above), he does think that the purposiveness found in nature provides a sort of hint that there is an intelligible principle behind the observable, natural world, and hence that the ultimate purpose of all of nature is a rational one. In connection with his moral theory and theory of human history (see sections 5 and 6 below), Kant will argue that the teleology of nature can be understood as ultimately directed towards a culmination in a fully rational nature, that is, humanity in its (future) final form.

5. Moral Theory

Kant’s moral theory is organized around the idea that to act morally and to act in accordance with reason are one and the same. In virtue of being a rational agent (that is, in virtue of possessing practical reason, reason which is interested and goal-directed), one is obligated to follow the moral law that practical reason prescribes. To do otherwise is to act irrationally. Because Kant places his emphasis on the duty that comes with being a rational agent who is cognizant of the moral law, Kant’s theory is considered a form of deontology (deon- comes from the Greek for “duty” or “obligation”).

Like his theoretical philosophy, Kant’s practical philosophy is a priori, formal, and universal: the moral law is derived non-empirically from the very structure of practical reason itself (its form), and since all rational agents share the same practical reason, the moral law binds and obligates everyone equally. So what is this moral law that obligates all rational agents universally and a priori? The moral law is determined by what Kant refers to as the Categorical Imperative, which is the general principle that demands that one respect the humanity in oneself and in others, that one not make an exception for oneself when deliberating about how to act, and in general that one only act in accordance with rules that everyone could and should obey.

Although Kant insists that the moral law is equally binding for all rational agents, he also insists that the bindingness of the moral law is self-imposed: we autonomously prescribe the moral law to ourselves. Because Kant thinks that the kind of autonomy in question here is only possible under the presupposition of a transcendentally free basis of moral choice, the constraint that the moral law places on an agent is not only consistent with freedom of the will, it requires it. Hence, one of the most important aspects of Kant’s project is to show that we are justified in presupposing that our morally significant choices are grounded in a transcendental freedom (the very sort of freedom that Kant argued we could not prove through mere “theoretical” or “speculative” reason; see 2gii above).

This section aims to explain the structure and content of Kant’s moral theory (5a-b), and also Kant’s claims that belief in freedom, God, and the immortality of the soul are necessary “postulates” of practical reason (5c). (On the relation between Kant’s moral theory and his aesthetic theory, see 7c below.)

a. The Good Will and Duty

Kant lays out the case for his moral theory in Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), Critique of Practical Reason (also known as the “Second Critique”; 1788), and the Metaphysics of Morals (1797). His arguments from the Groundwork are his most well-known and influential, so the following focuses primarily on them.

Kant begins his argument from the premise that a moral theory must be grounded in an account of what is unconditionally good. If something is merely conditionally good, that is, if its goodness depends on something else, then that other thing will either be merely conditionally good as well, in which case its goodness depends on yet another thing, or it will be unconditionally good. All goodness, then, must ultimately be traceable to something that is unconditionally good. There are many things that we typically think of as good but that are not truly unconditionally good. Beneficial resources such as money or power are often good, but since these things can be used for evil purposes, their goodness is conditional on the use to which they are put. Strength of character is generally a good thing, but again, if someone uses a strong character to successfully carry out evil plans, then the strong character is not good. Even happiness, according to Kant, is not unconditionally good. Although all humans universally desire to be happy, if someone is happy but does not deserve their happiness (because, for instance, their happiness results from stealing from the elderly), then it is not good for the person to be happy. Happiness is only good on the condition that the happiness is deserved.

Kant argues that there is only one thing that can be considered unconditionally good: a good will. A person has a good will insofar as they form their intentions on the basis of a self-conscious respect for the moral law, that is, for the rules regarding what a rational agent ought to do, one’s duty. The value of a good will lies in the principles on the basis of which it forms its intentions; it does not lie in the consequences of the actions that the intentions lead to. This is true even if a good will never leads to any desirable consequences at all: “Even if… this will should wholly lack the capacity to carry out its purpose… then, like a jewel, it would still shine by itself, as something that has its full worth in itself” (4:393). This is in line with Kant’s emphasis on the unconditional goodness of a good will: if a will were evaluated in terms of its consequences, then the goodness of the will would depend on (that is, would be conditioned on) those consequences. (In this respect, Kant’s deontology is in stark opposition to consequentialist moral theories, which base their moral evaluations on the consequences of actions rather than the intentions behind them.)

b. The Categorical Imperative

If a good will is one that forms its intentions on the basis of correct principles of action, then we want to know what sort of principles these are. A principle that commands an action is called an “imperative.” Most imperatives are “hypothetical imperatives,” that is, they are commands that hold only if certain conditions are met. For instance: “if you want to be a successful shopkeeper, then cultivate a reputation for honesty.” Since hypothetical imperatives are conditioned on desires and the intended consequences of actions, they cannot serve as the principles that determine the intentions and volitions of an unconditionally good will. Instead, we require what Kant calls a “categorical imperative.” Where hypothetical imperatives take the form, “if y is desired/intended/sought, do x,” categorical imperatives simply take the form, “do x.” Since a categorical imperative is stripped of all reference to the consequences of an action, it is thereby stripped of all determinate content, and hence it is purely formal. And since it is unconditional, it holds universally. Hence a categorical imperative expresses only the very form of a universally binding law: “nothing is left but the conformity of actions as such with universal law” (4:402). To act morally, then, is to form one’s intentions on the basis of the very idea of a universal principle of action.

This conception of a categorical imperative leads Kant to his first official formulation of the categorical imperative itself: “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). A maxim is a general rule that can be used to determine particular courses of actions in particular circumstances. For instance, the maxim “I shall lie when it will get me out of trouble” can be used to determine the decision to lie about an adulterous liaison. The categorical imperative offers a decision procedure for determining whether a given course of action is in accordance with the moral law. After determining what maxim one would be basing the action in question on, one then asks whether it would be possible, given the power (in an imagined, hypothetical scenario), to choose that everyone act in accordance with that same maxim. If it is possible to will that everyone act according to that maxim, then the action under consideration is morally permissible. If it is not possible to will that everyone act according to that maxim, the action is morally impermissible. Lying to cover up adultery is thus immoral because one cannot will that everyone act according to the maxim, “I shall lie when it will get me out of trouble.” Note that it is not simply that it would be undesirable for everyone to act according to that maxim. Rather, it would be impossible. Since everyone would know that everyone else was acting according to that maxim, there would never be the presupposition that anyone was telling the truth; the very act of lying, of course, requires such a presupposition on the part of the one being lied to. Hence, the state of affairs where everyone lies to get out of trouble can never arise, so it cannot be willed to be a universal law. It fails the test of the categorical imperative.

The point of Kant’s appeal to the universal law formulation of the categorical imperative is to show that an action is morally permissible only if the maxim on which the action is based could be affirmed as a universal law that everyone obeys without exception. The mark of immorality, then, is that one makes an exception for oneself. That is, one acts in a way that they would not want everyone else to. When someone chooses to lie about an adulterous liaison, one is implicitly thinking, “in general people should tell the truth, but in this case I will be the exception to the rule.”

Kant’s first formulation of the categorical imperative describes it in terms of the very form of universal law itself. This formal account abstracts from any specific content that the moral law might have for living, breathing human beings. Kant offers a second formulation to address the material side of the moral law. Since the moral law has to do with actions, and all actions are by definition teleological (that is, goal-directed), a material formulation of the categorical imperative will require an appeal to the “ends” of human activity. Some ends are merely instrumental, that is, they are sought only because they serve as “means” towards further ends. Kant argues that the moral law must be aimed at an end that is not merely instrumental, but is rather an end in itself. Only rational agents, according to Kant, are ends in themselves. To act morally is thus to respect rational agents as ends in themselves. Accordingly, the categorical imperative can be reformulated as follows: “So act that you use humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means” (4:429). The basic idea here is that it is immoral to treat someone as a thing of merely instrumental value; persons have an intrinsic (non-instrumental) value, and the moral law demands that we respect this intrinsic value. To return to the example of the previous paragraphs, it would be wrong to lie about an adulterous liaison because by withholding the truth one is manipulating the other person to make things easier for oneself; this sort of manipulation, however, amounts to treating the other as a thing (as a mere means to the comfort of not getting in trouble), and not as a person deserving of respect and entitled to the truth.

The notion of a universal law provides the form of the categorical imperative and rational agents as ends in themselves provide the matter. These two sides of the categorical imperative are combined into yet a third formulation, which appeals to the notion of a “kingdom of ends.” A kingdom of ends can be thought of as a sort of perfectly just utopian ideal in which all citizens of this kingdom freely respect the intrinsic worth of the humanity in all others because of an autonomously self-imposed recognition of the bindingness of the universal moral law for all rational agents. The third formulation of the categorical imperative is simply the idea that one should act in whatever way a member of this perfectly just society would act: “act in accordance with the maxims of a member giving universal laws for a merely possible kingdom of ends” (4:439). The idea of a kingdom of ends is an ideal (hence the “merely possible”). Although humanity may never be able to achieve such a perfect state of utopian coexistence, we can at least strive to approximate this state to an ever greater degree.

c. Postulates of Practical Reason

In Critique of Pure Reason, Kant had argued that although we can acknowledge the bare logical possibility that humans possess free will, that there is an immortal soul, and that there is a God, he also argued that we can never have positive knowledge of these things (see 2g above). In his ethical writings, however, Kant complicates this story. He argues that despite the theoretical impossibility of knowledge of these objects, belief in them is nevertheless a precondition for moral action (and for practical cognition generally). Accordingly, freedom, immortality, and God are “postulates of practical reason.” (The following discussion draws primarily on Critique of Practical Reason.)

We will start with freedom. Kant argues that morality and the obligation that comes with it are only possible if humans have free will. This is because the universal laws prescribed by the categorical imperative presuppose autonomy (autos = self; nomos = law). To be autonomous is to be the free ground of one’s own principles, or “laws” of action. Kant argues that if we presuppose that humans are rational and have free will, then his entire moral theory follows directly. The problem, however, lies in justifying the belief that we are free. Kant had argued in the Second Analogy of Experience that every event in the natural world has a “determining ground,” that is, a cause, and so all human actions, as natural events, themselves have deterministic causes (see 2f above). The only room for freedom of the will would lie in the realm of things in themselves, which contains the noumenal correlate of my phenomenal self. Since things in themselves are unknowable, I can never look to them to get evidence that I possess transcendental freedom. Kant gives at least two arguments to justify belief in freedom as a precondition of his moral theory. (There is a great deal of controversy among commentators regarding the exact form of his arguments, as well as their success. It will not be possible to adjudicate those disputes in any detail here. See Section 10 (References and Further Readings) for references to some of these commentaries.)

In the Groundwork, Kant suggests that the presupposition that we are free follows as a consequence of the fact that we have practical reason and that we think of ourselves as practical agents. Any time I face a choice that requires deliberation, I must consider the options before me as really open. If I thought of my course of action as already determined ahead of time, then there would not really be any choice to make. Furthermore, in taking my deliberation to be real, I also think of the possible outcomes of my actions as caused by me. The notion of a causality that originates in the self is the notion of a free will. So the very fact that I do deliberate about what actions I will take means that I am presupposing that my choice is real and hence that I am free. As Kant puts it, all practical agents act “under the idea of freedom” (4:448). It is not obvious that this argument is strong enough for Kant’s purposes. The position seems to be that I must act as though I am free, but acting as though I am free in no way entails that I really am free. At best, it seems that since I act as though I am free, I thereby must act as though morality really does obligate me. This does not establish that the moral law really does obligate me.

In the Second Critique, Kant offers a different argument for the reality of freedom. He argues that it is a brute “fact of reason” (5:31) that the categorical imperative (and so morality generally) obligates us as rational agents. In other words, all rational agents are at least implicitly conscious of the bindingness of the moral law on us. Since morality requires freedom, it follows that if morality is real, then freedom must be real too. Thus this “fact of reason” allows for an inference to the reality of freedom. Although the conclusion of this argument is stronger than the earlier argument, its premise is more controversial. For instance, it is far from obvious that all rational agents are conscious of the moral law. If they were, how come no one discovered this exact moral law before 1785 when Kant wrote the Groundwork? Equally problematic, it is not clear why this “fact of reason” should count as knowledge of the bindingness of the moral law. It may just be that we cannot help but believe that the moral law obligates us, in which case we once again end up merely acting as though we are free and as though the moral law is real.

Again, there is much debate in the literature about the structure and success of Kant’s arguments. It is clear, however, that the success of Kant’s moral project stands or falls with his arguments for freedom of the will, and that the overall strength of this theory is determined to a high degree by the epistemic status of our belief in our own freedom.

Kant’s arguments for immortality and God as postulates of practical reason presuppose that the reality of the moral law and the freedom of the will have been established, and they also depend on the principle that “‘ought’ implies ‘can’”: one cannot be obligated to do something unless the thing in question is doable. For instance, there is no sense in which I am obligated to single-handedly solve global poverty, because it is not within my power to do so. According to Kant, the ultimate aim of a rational moral agent should be to become perfectly moral. We are obligated to strive to become ever more moral. Given the “ought implies can” principle, if we ought to work towards moral perfection, then moral perfection must be possible and we can become perfect. However, Kant holds that moral perfection is something that finite rational agents such as humans can only progress towards, but not actually attain in any finite amount of time, and certainly not within any one human lifetime. Thus the moral law demands an “endless progress” towards “complete conformity of the will with the moral law” (5:122). This endless progress towards perfection can only be demanded of us if our own existence is endless. In short, one’s belief that one should strive towards moral perfection presupposes the belief in the immortality of the soul.

In addition to the “ought implies can” principle, Kant’s argument about belief in God also involves an elaboration of the notion of the “highest good” at which all moral action aims (at least indirectly). According to Kant, the highest good, that is, the most perfect possible state for a community of rational agents, is not only one in which all agents act in complete conformity with the moral law. It is also a state in which these agents are happy. Kant had argued that although everyone naturally desires to be happy, happiness is only good when one deserves to be happy. In the ideal scenario of a morally perfect community of rational agents, everyone deserves to be happy. Since a deserved happiness is a good thing, the highest good will involve a situation in which everyone acts in complete conformity with the moral law and everyone is completely happy because they deserve to be. Now since we are obligated to work towards this highest good, this complete, universal, morally justified happiness must be possible (again, because “ought” implies “can”). This is where a puzzle arises. Although happiness is connected to morality at the conceptual level when one deserves happiness, there is no natural connection between morality and happiness. Our happiness depends on the natural world (for example, whether we are healthy, whether natural disasters affect us), and the natural world operates according to laws that are completely separate from the laws of morality. Accordingly, acting morally is in general no guarantee that nature will make it possible for one to be happy. If anything, behaving morally will often decrease one’s happiness (for doing the right thing often involves doing the uncomfortable, difficult thing). And we all have plenty of empirical evidence from the world we live in that often bad things happen to good people and good things happen to bad people. Thus if the highest good (in which happiness is proportioned to virtue) is possible, then somehow there must be a way for the laws of nature to eventually lead to a situation in which happiness is proportioned to virtue. (Note that since at this point in the argument, Kant takes himself to have established immortality as a postulate of practical reason, this “eventually” may very well be far in the future). Since the laws of nature and the laws of morality are completely separate on their own, the only way that the two could come together such that happiness ends up proportioned to virtue would be if the ultimate cause and ground of nature set up the world in such a way that the laws of nature would eventually lead to the perfect state in question. Therefore, the possibility of the highest good requires the presupposition that the cause of the world is intelligent and powerful enough to set nature up in the right way, and also that it wills in accordance with justice that eventually the laws of nature will indeed lead to a state in which the happiness of rational agents is proportioned to their virtue. This intelligent, powerful, and just cause of the world is what traditionally goes by the name of “God.” Hence God is a postulate of practical reason.

6. Political Theory and Theory of Human History

Kant’s ethical theory emphasized reason, autonomy, and a respect for the humanity of others. These central aspects of his theory of individual moral choice are carried over to his theories of humanity’s history and of ideal political organization. This section covers Kant’s teleological history of the human race (6a), the basic elements of his political theory (6b), and his theory of the possibility of world peace (6c).

a. Human History and the Age of Enlightenment

Kant’s socio-political philosophy must be understood in terms of his understanding of the history of humanity, of its teleology, and in terms of his particular time and place: Europe during the Enlightenment.

In his short essay “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose” (1784), Kant outlines a speculative sketch of humanity’s history organized around his conception of the teleology intrinsic to the species. The natural purpose of humanity is the development of reason. This development is not something that can take place in one individual lifetime, but is instead the ongoing project of humanity across the generations. Nature fosters this goal through both human physiology and human psychology. Humans have no fur, claws, or sharp teeth, and so if we are to be sheltered and fed, we must use our reason to create the tools necessary to satisfy our needs. More importantly, at the cultural level, Kant argues that human society is characterized by an “unsocial sociability”: on the one hand, humans need to live with other humans and we feel incomplete in isolation; but on the other, we frequently disagree with each other and are frustrated when others don’t agree with us on important matters. The frustration brought on by disagreement serves as an incentive to develop our capacity to reason so that we can argue persuasively and convince others to agree with us.

By means of our physiological deficiencies and our unsocial sociability, nature has nudged us, generation by generation, to develop our capacity for reason and slowly to emerge from the hazy fog of pre-history up to the present. This development is not yet complete. Kant takes stock of where we were in his day, in late 18th c. Prussia) in his short, popular essay: “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” (1784). To be enlightened, he argues, is to determine one’s beliefs and actions in accordance with the free use of one’s reason. The process of enlightenment is humanity’s “emergence from its self-incurred immaturity” (8:35), that is, the emergence from an uncritical reliance on the authority of others (for example, parents, monarchs, or priests). This is a slow, on-going process. Kant thought that his own age was an age of enlightenment, but not yet a fully enlightened age.

The goal of humanity is to reach a point where all interpersonal interactions are conducted in accordance with reason, and hence in accordance with the moral law (this is the idea of a kingdom of ends described in 5b above). Kant thinks that there are two significant conditions that must be in place before such an enlightened age can come to be. First, humans must live in a perfectly just society under a perfectly just constitution. Second, the nations of the world must coexist as an international federation in a state of “perpetual peace.” Some aspects of the first condition are discussed in 6b, and of the second in 6c.

b. Political Theory

Kant fullest articulation of his political theory appears in the “Doctrine of Right,” which is the first half of Metaphysics of Morals (1797). In line with his belief that a freedom grounded in rationality is what bestows dignity upon human beings, Kant organizes his theory of justice around the notion of freedom: “Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law, or if on its maxim the freedom of choice of each can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law” (6:230). Implicit in this definition is a theory of equality: everyone should be granted the same degree of freedom. Although a state, through the passing and enforcing of laws, necessarily restricts freedom to some degree, Kant argues that this is necessary for the preservation of equality of human freedom. This is because when the freedoms of all are unchecked (for example, in the state of nature, which is also a condition of anarchy), the strong will overpower the weak and infringe on their freedoms, in which case freedoms will not be distributed equally, contrary to Kant’s basic principle of right. Hence a fair and lawful coercion that restricts freedom is consistent with and required by maximal and equal degrees of freedom for all.

Kant holds that republicanism is the ideal form of government. In a republic, voters elect representatives and these representatives decide on particular laws on behalf of the people. (Kant shows that he was not free of the prejudices of his day, and claims, with little argument, that neither women nor the poor should be full citizens with voting rights.) Representatives are duty-bound to choose these laws from the perspective of the “general will” (a term Kant borrows from Rousseau), rather than from the perspective of the interests of any one individual or group within society. Even though the entire population does not vote on each individual law, a law is said to be just only in case an entire population of rational agents could and would consent to the law. In this respect, Kant’s theory of just law is analogous to his universal law formulation of the categorical imperative: both demand that it be possible in principle for everyone to affirm the rule in question (see 5b above).

Among the freedoms that ought to be respected in a just society (republican or otherwise) are the freedom to pursue happiness in any way one chooses (so long as this pursuit does not infringe the rights of others, of course), freedom of religion, and freedom of speech. These last two are especially important to Kant and he associated them with the ongoing enlightenment of humanity in “What is Enlightenment?” He argues that it “would be a crime against human nature” (8:39) to legislate religious doctrine because doing so would be to deny to humans the very free use of reason that makes them human. Similarly, restrictions on what Kant calls the “public use of one’s reason” are contrary to the most basic teleology of the human species, namely, the development of reason. Kant himself had felt the sting of an infringement on these rights when the government of Friedrich Wilhelm II (the successor to Frederick the Great) prohibited Kant from publishing anything further on matters pertaining to religion.

c. Perpetual Peace

Kant elaborates the cosmopolitan theory first proposed in “Idea for a Universal History” in his Towards Perpetual Peace (1795). The basic idea is that world peace can be achieved only when international relations mirror, in certain respects, the relations between individuals in a just society. Just as people cannot be traded as things, so too states cannot be traded as though they were mere property. Just as individuals must respect others’ rights to free self-determination, so too, “no state shall forcibly interfere in the constitution and government of another state” (8:346). And in general, just as individuals need to arrange themselves into just societies, states, considered as individuals themselves, must arrange themselves into a global federation, a “league of nations” (8:354). Of course, until a state of perpetual peace is reached, wars will be inevitable. Even in times of wars, however, certain laws must be respected. For instance, it is never permissible for hostilities to become so violent as to undermine the possibility of a future peace treaty.

Kant argued that republicanism is especially conducive to peace, and he argued that perpetual peace would require that all states be republics. This is because the people will only consent to a war if they are willing to bear the economic burdens that war brings, and such a cost will only be worthwhile when there is a truly dire threat. If only the will of the monarch is required to go to war, since the monarch will not have to bear the full burden of the war (the cost will be distributed among the subjects), there is much less disincentive against war.

According to Kant, war is the result of an imbalance or disequilibrium in international relations. Although wars are never desirable, they lead to new conditions in international relations, and sometimes these new conditions are more balanced than the previous ones. When they are more balanced, there is less chance of new war occurring. Overall then, although the progression is messy and violent along the way, the slow march towards perpetual peace is a process in which all the states of the world slowly work towards a condition of balance and equilibrium.

7. Theory of Art and Beauty

Kant’s most worked out presentation of his views on aesthetics appears in Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), also known as the “Third Critique.” As the title implies, Kant’s aesthetic theory is cashed out through an analysis of the operations of the faculty of judgment. That is, Kant explains what it is for something to be beautiful by explaining what goes into the judgment that something is beautiful. This section explains the structure of aesthetic judgments of the beautiful and the sublime (7a), summarizes Kant’s theory of art and the genius behind art (7b), and finally explains the connection between Kant’s aesthetic theory and his moral theory (7c).

a. The Beautiful and the Sublime

Kant holds that there are three different types of aesthetic judgments: judgments of the agreeable, of the beautiful, and of the sublime. The first is not particularly interesting, because it pertains simply to whatever objects happen to cause us (personally) pleasure or pain. There is nothing universal about such judgments. If one person finds botanical gin pleasant and another does not, there is no disagreement, simply different responses to the stimulus. Judgments of the beautiful and the sublime, however, are more interesting and worth spending some time on.

Let us consider judgments of beauty (which Kant calls “judgments of taste”) first. Kant argues that all judgments of taste involve four components, or “moments.” First, judgments of taste involve a subjective yet disinterested enjoyment. We have an appreciation for the object without desiring it. This contrasts judgments of taste from both cognitions, which represent objects as they are rather than how they affect us, and desires, which represent objects in terms of what we want. Second, judgments of taste involve universality. When we judge an object to be beautiful, implicit in the judgment is the belief that everyone should judge the object in the same way. Third, judgments of taste involve the form of purposiveness, or “purposeless purposiveness.” Beautiful objects seem to be “for” something, even though there is nothing determinate that they are for. Fourth, judgments of taste involve necessity. When presented with a beautiful object, I take it that I ought to judge it as beautiful. Taken together, the theory is this: when I judge something as beautiful, I enjoy the object without having any desires with respect to it, I believe that everyone should judge the object to be beautiful, I represent some kind of purposiveness in it, but without applying any concepts that would determine its specific purpose, and I also represent myself as being obligated to judge it to be beautiful. Judgments of beauty are thus quite peculiar. On the one hand, when we say an object is beautiful, it is not the same sort of predication as when I say something is green, is a horse, or fits in a breadbox. Yet it is not for that reason a purely subjective, personal judgment because of the necessity and intersubjective universality involved in such judgments.

A further remark is in order regarding the “form of purposiveness” in judgments of taste. Kant wants to emphasize that no determinate concepts are involved in judgments of taste, but that the “reflective” power of judgment (that is, judgment’s ability to seek to find a suitable concept to fit an object) is nevertheless very active during such judgments. When I encounter an unfamiliar object, my reflective judgment is set in motion and seeks a concept until I figure out what sort of thing the object is. When I encounter a beautiful object, the form of purposiveness in the object also sets my reflecting judgment in motion, but no determinate concept is ever found for the object. Although this might be expected to lead to frustration, Kant instead claims that it provokes a “free play” (5:217) between the imagination and understanding. Kant does not say as much about this “free play” as one would like, but the idea seems to be that since the experience is not constrained by a determinate concept that must be applied to the object, the imagination and understanding are free to give in to a lively interplay of thought and emotion in response to the object. The experience of this free play of the faculties is the part of the aesthetic experience that we take to be enjoyable.

Aside from judgments of taste, there is another important form of aesthetic experience: the experience of the sublime. According to Kant, the experience of the sublime occurs when we face things (whether natural or manmade) that dwarf the imagination and make us feel tiny and insignificant in comparison. When we face something so large that we cannot come up with a concept to adequately capture its magnitude, we experience a feeling akin to vertigo. A good example of this is the “Deep Field” photographs from the Hubble Telescope. We already have trouble comprehending the enormity of the Milky Way, but when we see an image containing thousands of other galaxies of approximately the same size, the mind cannot even hope to comprehend the immensity of what is depicted. Although this sort of experience can be disconcerting, Kant also says that a disinterested pleasure (similar to the pleasure in the beautiful) is experienced when the ideas of reason pertaining to the totality of the cosmos are brought into play. Although the understanding can have no empirical concept of such an indeterminable magnitude, reason has such an idea (in Kant’s technical sense of “idea”; see 2g above), namely, the idea of the world as an indefinitely large totality. This feeling that reason can subsume and capture even the totality of the immeasurable cosmos leads to the peculiar pleasure of the sublime.

b. Theory of Art

Both natural objects and manmade art can be judged to be beautiful. Kant suggests that natural beauties are purest, but works of art are especially interesting because they result from human genius. The following briefly summarizes Kant’s theory of art and genius.

Although art must be manmade and not natural, Kant holds that art is beautiful insofar as it imitates the beauty of nature. Specifically, a beautiful work of art must display the “form of purposiveness” (described above, 7a) that can be encountered in the natural world. What makes great art truly great, though, is that it is the result of genius in the artist. According to Kant, genius is the innate talent possessed by the exceptional, gifted individual that allows that individual to translate an intangible “aesthetic idea” into a tangible work of art. Aesthetic ideas are the counterparts to the ideas of reason (see 2g above): where ideas of reason are concepts for which no sensible intuition is adequate, aesthetic ideas are representations of the imagination for which no concept is adequate (this is in line with Kant’s claim that beauty is not determinately conceptualizable).  When a genius is successful at exhibiting an aesthetic idea in a beautiful work of art, the work will provoke the “free play” of the faculties described above (7a).

Kant divides the arts into three groups: the arts of speech (rhetoric and poetry), pictorial arts (sculpture, architecture, and painting), and the art of the play of sensations (music and “the art of colors”) (5:321ff.). These can, of course, be combined together. For instance opera combines music and poetry into song, and combines this with theatre (which Kant considers a form of painting). Kant deems poetry the greatest of the arts because of its ability to stimulate the imagination and understanding and expand the mind through reflection. Music is the most successful if judged in terms of “charm and movement of the mind” (5:328), because it evokes the affect and feeling of human speech, but without being constrained by the determinate concepts of actual words. However, if the question is which art advances culture the most, Kant thinks that painting is better than music.

One consequence of Kant’s theory of art is that the contemporary notion of “conceptual art” is a contradiction in terms: if there is a specific point or message (a determinate concept) that the artist is trying to get across, then the work cannot provoke the indeterminate free play that is necessary for the experience of the beautiful. At best, such works can be interesting or provocative, but not truly beautiful and hence not truly art.

c. Relation to Moral Theory

A final important aspect of Kant’s aesthetic theory is his claim that beauty is a “symbol” of morality (5:351ff.), and aesthetic judgment thereby functions as a sort of “propaedeutic” for moral cognition. This is because certain aspects of judgments of taste (see 7a above) are analogous in important respects to moral judgments. The immediacy and disinterestedness of aesthetic appreciation corresponds to the demand that moral virtue be praised even when it does not lead to tangibly beneficial consequences: it is good in itself. The free play of the faculties involved in appreciation of the beautiful reminds one of the freedom necessary for and presupposed by morality. And the universality and necessity involved in aesthetic judgments correspond to the universality and necessity of the moral law. In short, Kant holds that a cultivated sensitivity to aesthetic pleasures helps prepare the mind for moral cognition. Aesthetic appreciation makes one sensitive to the fact that there are pleasures beyond the merely agreeable just as there are goods beyond the merely instrumental.

8. Pragmatic Anthropology

Together with a course on “physical geography” (a study of the world), Kant taught a class on “pragmatic anthropology” almost every year of his career as a university teacher. Towards the end of his career, Kant allowed his collected lecture notes for his anthropology course to be edited and published as Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1789). Anthropology, for Kant, is simply the study of human nature. Pragmatic anthropology is useful, practical knowledge that students would need in order to successfully navigate the world and get through life.

The Anthropology is interesting in two very different ways. First, Kant presents detailed discussions of his views on issues related to empirical psychology, moral psychology, and aesthetic taste that fill out and give substance to the highly abstract presentations of his writings in pure theoretical philosophy. For instance, although in the theory of experience from Critique of Pure Reason Kant argues that we need sensory intuitions in order to have empirical cognition of the world, he does not explain in any detail how our specific senses—sight, hearing, touch, taste, smell—contribute to this cognition. The Anthropology fills in a lot of this story. For instance, we learn that sight and hearing are necessary for us to represent objects as public and intersubjectively available. And we learn that touch is necessary for us to represent objects as solid, and hence as substantial. With respect to his moral theory, many of Kant’s ethical writings can give the impression that emotions and sentiments can only work against morality, and that only pure reason can incline one towards the good. In the Anthropology Kant complicates this story, informing us that nature has implanted sentiments of compassion to incline us towards the good, even in the absence of a developed reason. Once reason has been developed, it can promote an “enthusiasm of good resolution” (7:254) through attention to concrete instances of virtuous action, in which case desire can work in cooperation with reason’s moral law, not against it. Kant also supplements his moral theory through pedagogical advice about how to cultivate an inclination towards moral behavior.

The other aspect of the Anthropology (and the student transcripts of his actual lectures) that makes it so interesting is that the wealth and range of examples and discussions gives a much fuller picture of Kant the person than we can get from his more technical writings. The many examples present a picture of a man with wide-ranging opinions on all aspects of the human experience. There are discussions of dreams, humor, boredom, personality-types, facial expressions, pride and greed, gender and race issues, and more. We even get some fashion advice: it is acceptable to wear yellow under a blue coat, but gaudy to wear blue under a yellow coat. There has been a great deal of renewed interest in Kant’s anthropological writings and many commentators have been appealing to these often neglected texts as a helpful resource that provides contextualization of Kant’s more widely studied theoretical output.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Literature

The best scholarly, English translations of Kant’s work are published by Cambridge University Press as the Cambridge Editions of the Works of Immanuel Kant. The following are from that collection and contain some of Kant’s most important and influential writings.

  • Critique of Pure Reason, trans. Paul Guyer and Allen Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Practical Philosophy, ed. Mary Gregor. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. (Contains most of Kant’s ethical writings, including Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, Critique of Practical Reason, and Metaphysics of Morals.)
  • Critique of the Power of Judgment, trans. Paul Guyer and Eric MatthewsCambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770, ed. David Walford. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. (Contains most of Kant’s “pre-critical” writings in theoretical philosophy.)
  • Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, eds. Henry Allison and Peter Heath. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002 (Contains Kant’s mature writings in theoretical philosophy, including Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics and Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science.)
  • History, Anthropology, and Education, eds. Günter Zöller and Robert Louden. . Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. (Contains, among other writings, Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View.)

b. Secondary Literature

  • Ernst Cassirer (Kant’s Life and Thought, tr. by James Haden. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1983 (originally written in 1916)) and Manfred Kuehn (Kant: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002) both offer intellectual biographies that situate the development of Kant’s thought within the context of his life and times.
  • For comprehensive discussions of the metaphysics and epistemology of Critique of Pure Reason, see Paul Guyer (Kant and the Claims of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987), Henry Allison (Kant’s Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, Second Edition. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004), and Graham Bird (The Revolutionary Kant: A Commentary on the Critique of Pure Reason. Chicago: Open Court Press, 2006).
  • For treatments of Kant’s ethical theory, see Allen Wood (Kant’s Ethical Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), Christine Korsgaard (Creating the Kingdom of Ends. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), and Onora O’Neill (Constructions of Reason: Explorations of Kant’s Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
  • For analyses of Kant’s aesthetic theory (as well as other issues from the Third Critique), see Rachel Zuckert (Kant on Beauty and Biology: An Interpretation of the ‘Critique of Judgment’. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010), Paul Guyer (Kant and the Claims of Taste. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), and Henry Allison (Kant’s Theory of Taste: A Reading of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).
  • For studies of Kant’s anthropology and theory of human nature, see Patrick Frierson (What is the Human Being? London: Routledge, 2013) and Alix Cohen (Kant and the Human Sciences: Biology, Anthropology and History. London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2009).


Author Information

Tim Jankowiak
Towson University
U. S. A.

Francis Hutcheson (1694—1745)

Francis HutchesonFrancis Hutcheson was an eighteenth-century Scottish philosopher whose meticulous writings and activities influenced life in Scotland, Great Britain, Europe, and even the newly formed North American colonies. For historians and political scientists, the emphasis has been on his theories of liberalism and political rights; for philosophers and psychologists, Hutcheson’s importance comes from his theories of human nature, which include an account of an innate care and concern for others and of the internal senses (including the moral sense). The latter were pivotal to the Scottish Enlightenment’s empirical aesthetics, and all of Hutcheson’s theories were important to moral sentimentalism. One cannot properly study the works of Adam Smith, Hutcheson’s most famous student, or David Hume’s moral and political theories, without first understanding Hutcheson’s contributions and influence.

Popular and well-read in his day, Hutcheson’s writings seem to be enjoying resurgence specifically among libertarians, contemporary moral psychologists and philosophers. The latter are taking another and more in-depth look at Hutcheson and the rest of the sentimentalists because present-day empirical studies seem to support many of their claims about human nature. This is not surprising because the philosophical theories of the Scottish Enlightenment were based on human observations and experiences, much of which would be considered psychology today.

As part of his attempt to defend Shaftesbury against the attacks of Bernard Mandeville, Hutcheson's writings concentrate on human nature. Hutcheson also promoted a natural benevolence against the egoism of Thomas Hobbes and against the reward/punishment view of Samuel Pufendorf by appealing to our own experiences of ourselves and others.

What follows is an overview of Hutcheson’s life, works and influence, with special attention paid to his writings on aesthetics, morality, and the importance of the internal senses of beauty, harmony, and the moral sense.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Internal Senses
  3. Moral Sense Faculty
    1. Operations of moral sense faculty
    2. Sense vs. Reason
    3. Basis of Moral Determinations
  4. Benevolence: Response to Hobbes and Pufendorf
  5. Influences on Hume and Smith
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Hutcheson
      1. Collected Works and Correspondence
    2. Secondary Readings

1. Life

Francis Hutcheson was born to Scottish parents on August 8, 1694 in Ireland. Though remembered primarily as a philosopher, he was also a Presbyterian minister, as were his father and grandfather before him. After he attended the University of Glasgow in Scotland in 1711 he returned to Dublin in 1716. Rather than taking a ministry position he was asked to start an academy in Dublin, and it was here that he wrote his most influential works. At this time he also married Mary Wilson and had one son, Francis. Eventually he was appointed professor and chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Glasgow in 1729 following the death of his mentor and teacher, Gershom Carmichael.

Hutcheson was a popular lecturer perhaps because he was the first professor to use English in lectures rather than the commonly used Latin and also, possibly influenced by his preaching experience, was more animated than was typical of an eighteenth-century academic. Throughout his career he retained a commitment to the liberal arts as his thoughts and theories were always connected to the ancient traditions, especially those of Aristotle and Cicero. His writings were respected even before his Glasgow position and this reputation continued throughout his lifetime. His most influential pieces, first published in Dublin anonymously, were An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (1725) and An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections, with Illustrations of the Moral Sense (1728). Hutcheson’s moral theory was influenced most by Lord Shaftesbury, while his aesthetics were in many ways influenced by and a response to John Locke’s primary and secondary qualities. Those who read and were influenced by Hutcheson’s theories included David Hume and Adam Smith, his student at Glasgow, while Thomas Reid and Immanuel Kant both cited Hutcheson in their writings.

Francis Hutcheson died in 1745 after 16 years at Glasgow while on a visit to Ireland, where he is buried.  After his death, his son and namesake published another edition of Hutcheson’s Illustrations on the Moral Sense in 1746 and in 1755, A System of Moral Philosophy, a text written specifically for college students.

2. Internal Senses

Though Shaftesbury could be called the father of modern aesthetics, Hutcheson’s thorough treatment of the internal senses, especially of beauty, grandeur, harmony, novelty, order and design in the Inquiry, is what specifically moved the focus of study from rational explanations to the sensations. For Hutcheson the perception of beauty does depend on the external sense of sight; however, the internal sense of beauty operates as an internal or reflex sense. The same is the case with hearing: hearing music does not necessarily give the perception of harmony as it is distinct from the hearing (Inquiry I. I. X). Yet, the internal senses are senses because like the external senses they are immediate perceptions not needing knowledge of cause or advantage to receive the idea of beauty. Both the external and internal senses are characterized by a passive and involuntary nature, and the internal senses are a source of pleasure and pain. With a nod to Locke’s primary and secondary qualities (Inquiry I, 1 7), Hutcheson described perception specifically of beauty and harmony in terms of simple and complex ideas. Without the internal sense of beauty there is no perception of it: “This superior power of perception is justly called a sense, because of its affinity to the other senses in this, that the pleasure does not arise from any knowledge of principles, proportions, causes, or of the usefulness of the object; but strikes us at first with the idea of beauty: nor does the most accurate knowledge increase this pleasure of beauty, however it may super-add a distinct rational pleasure from prospects of advantage, or from the increase of knowledge” (Inquiry I, 1, 8).

The perception of beauty though excited by an object is not possible without this internal sense of beauty. There is a specific type of absolute beauty and there are figures that excite this idea of beauty. We experience this when recognizing what Hutcheson calls “uniformity amidst variety” (Inquiry, I, 2, 3). This happens with both mathematical and natural objects, which although multifaceted and complex, are perceived with a distinct uniformity. The proportions of an animal or human figure can also excite and touch the internal sense as absolute beauty. Imitative beauty, on the other hand, is perceived in comparison to something else or as an imitation in art, poetry, or even in an idea. The comparison is what excites this sense of beauty even when the original being imitated is not singularly beautiful.

Hutcheson wondered why there would be a question about whether there were internal senses since they, like the external ones, are prominent in our own experiences. Perhaps one of the reasons that the internal senses are questioned more than the external is because there are no common names for them such as ‘hearing’ and ‘seeing’ (Inquiry, I. VI, IX). There is no easy way to describe the sense that feels beauty, yet we all experience it in the presence of beauty. Though this internal sense can be influenced by knowledge and experience it is not consciously controlled and is involuntary. Moving aesthetics away from logic and mathematical truths does not make it any less real and important for our pleasure as felt in the appreciation and experience of beauty and harmony. The internal senses also include the moral sense, so called by Shaftesbury and developed thoroughly by Hutcheson.

3. Moral Sense Faculty

a. Operations of moral sense faculty

Hutcheson, like Shaftesbury, claimed moral judgments were made in the human faculty that Shaftesbury called a moral sense. Both believed human nature contained all it needed to make moral decisions, along with inclinations to be moral.

The process, Hutcheson described, begins with a feeling of pleasure or advantage felt in the moral sense faculty—not necessarily to us but advantageous to someone or generally for everyone. This perception of pleasure has a specific moral flavor and causes us to feel moral approbation. We feel this pleasure when considering what is good or beneficial to others as a part of our natural instinct of benevolence. The things pursued for this pleasure are wanted because of our self-love and interest in the good for others. So first there is a sense of pleasure; then there is the interest in what causes the pleasure. From there, our experience or reason can tell us what objects have and may continue to give us pleasure or advantage (Hutcheson 1725, 70). For Hutcheson, the moral sense thus described is from God, implanted, not like innate ideas, but as an innate sense of pleasure for objects that are not necessarily to our advantage—and for nobler pleasures like caring for others or appreciation of harmony (Hutcheson 1725, I.VIII, 83).

Evaluating what is good or not—what we morally approve of or disapprove of—is done by this moral sense. The moral sense is not the basis of moral decisions or the justification of our disapproval as the rationalists claim; instead it is better explained as the faculty with which we feel the value of an action. It does not justify our evaluation; the moral sense gives us our evaluation. The moral faculty gives us our sense of valuing—not feeling in an emotional sense as that would be something like sadness or joy.  There is feeling, but the feeling is a valuing type of feeling.

Like the other internal senses of beauty and harmony, people are born with a moral sense. We know this because we experience moral feelings of approbation and disapprobation. We do not choose to make moral approvals or disapprovals; they just happen to us and we feel the approvals when they occur. Hutcheson put it this way: “approbation is not what we can voluntarily bring upon ourselves” (Hutcheson 1728, I. 412). He continued that in spite of the fact that it is a pleasurable experience to approve of actions, we cannot just approve of anything or anyone when we want to. Hutcheson gives illustrations of this: for instance, people do not “approve as virtuous the eating a bunch of grapes, taking a glass of wine, or sitting down when tired” (ibid.). The point is that moral approvals and disapprovals done by our moral sense are specific in nature and only operate when there is an action that can be appropriately judged of by our moral sense (ibid.). Another way to make this point is to compare the moral sense to the olfactory sense. I can put my nose to this ceramic cup in front of me but my nose will not smell anything if there is nothing to smell. The moral sense operates when an idea touches it the same way a nose smells when there is an odor reaching it. No odor, no smell; no moral issue, no moral sentiment. For Hutcheson, the moral sense is involved and included when the agent reflects on an action or a spectator observes them in reference to the action’s circumstances, specifically those whom it affects (Hutcheson 1728, I. 408). So when an action has consequences for others, it is more likely to awaken our moral sensibility.

Reasoning and information can change the evaluation of the moral sense, but no amount of reasoning can or does precede the moral sense in regard to its approval of what is for the public good. Reason does, however, inform the moral sense, as discussed below. The moral sense approves of the good for others. This concern for others by the moral sense is what is natural to humankind, Hutcheson contended. Reason gives content to the moral sense, informing it of what is good for others and the public good (Hutcheson 1728, I. 411).

Some may think Hutcheson a utilitarian and certainly no thorough accounting of historical utilitarianism is complete without a mention of Hutcheson. Consider the following statement from Hutcheson: “In the same manner, the moral evil, or vice, is as the degree of misery, and number of sufferers; so that, that action is best, which procures the greatest happiness for the greatest numbers; and that, worst, which, in like manner, occasions, misery.” Preceding this, though, is the phrase, “…we are led by our moral sense of virtue to judge thus…” (Inquiry, II, 3, 8). So it is our moral sense that evaluates goodness and evil and does seem to evaluate much like a utilitarian, but it is not bound by the utilitarian rule—moral sense evaluations are normatively privileged and prior to moral rules of any kind.

In Illustrations upon the Moral Sense (1728), Hutcheson gives definitions of both the approbation of our own actions and those of others. Approbation of our own action is given when we are pleased with ourselves for doing the action and/or pleased with our intentions for doing the action. Hutcheson puts it this way: “[A]pprobation of our own action denotes, or is attended with, a pleasure in the contemplation of it, and in reflection upon the affections which inclined us to it” (I. 403). Consider what happens when someone picks up and returns something that another person drops. In response to the action, the person who picked up the dropped item would have feelings of approbation toward their own action. This person would be happy with what they did, especially after giving it some thought. Further, they would be pleased if their own intentions were ones with which they could also be pleased. The intention could possibly be that they just wanted to help this person; however, if the intention was to gain advantage with the other person, then they would not be as pleased with themselves. Approbation of another’s action is much the same except that the observer is pleased to witness the action of the other person and feels affection toward the agent of the action. Again Hutcheson:

[A]pprobation of the action of another has some little pleasure in attending it in the observer, and raises love toward the agent, in whom the quality approved is deemed to reside, and not in the observer, who has a satisfaction in the act of approving (Hutcheson 1728, 403).

There is a distinction, Hutcheson claimed, between choosing to do an action or wanting someone else to do an action and our approbation of the action. According to Hutcheson, we often act in ways we disapprove of (ibid. 403). All I have to think of is the extra cookie I have just consumed: upon reflection I am not pleased with my choice; I disapprove of eating the cookie.

b. Sense vs. Reason

In response to the difficulty philosophers seem to have understanding the separate operations of sensing—done by the moral sense—and intellectual reasoning, Hutcheson referred to the ancients—a common element in his writing—and the division of the soul between the will (desires, appetites, ‘sensus’) and the intellect. Philosophers who think reasons motivate and/or judge have conflated the will into the intellect (Hutcheson 1728, 405). In this same discussion, Hutcheson, borrowing from Aristotle, explained that reason and the intellect help determine how to reach an end or goal. Yet the desire for that goal is the job of the will. The will is moved by the desire for that end which, of course, for Aristotle, was happiness (ibid. I. 405-6).

There has to be a desire for the will to choose something. Something is chosen because it is seen as a possible fulfillment of a human desire. For Hutcheson, there is a natural instinct and desire for the good of others. Without this natural desire, Hutcheson claimed, no one would care whether an action benefits or harms one person or many. Information may be sound and true about the dangers of an action, yet without the instinct to care about those who would be benefited or harmed the information would not move our passions (ibid. I. 406-7). The only reason to care about a natural disaster 1,000 miles away where we do not know anyone and we are not affected even indirectly is that we care about others in general and do not wish harm on them. A person can only want something if the desire for it is connected to or understood to be satisfying a certain natural instinct or affection (ibid. I. 404). This instinct or desire for the welfare of others is what influences our moral sense to approve or disapprove of an action.

Reasons and discussions that excite and motivate presuppose instincts and affections (ibid.). To be moved means there is an instinct that is moved. Consider a different type of instinct like one’s instinct for happiness. Hutcheson explained it this way: “[T]here is an instinct or desire fixed in his nature, determining him to pursue his happiness: but it is not this reflection on his own nature, or this [some] proposition which excites or determines him, but the instinct itself” (ibid. I. 406). It is not the proposition that a certain act will produce lots of money that excites a person, but rather the instinct toward happiness and the belief that money will bring the desired happiness. So reasoning that leads a person to believe that money will bring happiness presupposes an instinct that values happiness. Reasons that justify or explain something as being moral or immoral presuppose a moral sense (ibid. 404). If there are reasons for something and those reasons are considered, a moral sense must exist that cares about and utilizes the information.

Hutcheson thought one of the reasons there was confusion and opposition to the idea of moral judgment coming from one’s instincts or affections is the violent, passionate actions that are observed in people and would not be effective as moral evaluators. Yet Hutcheson was not claiming that these passions and out-of-control desires are the source of moral judgment; it is “the calm desire or affection which employs our reason freely…” (ibid. IV. 413). Also, for Hutcheson, “the most perfect virtue consists in the calm, impassionate benevolence, rather than in particular affection” (ibid.). So not only are the moral passions calm, they naturally respond positively to behaviors that benefit the public good. Hutcheson did not claim that this should be the case and, therefore, it is not the normative claim utilitarianism makes; rather, what Hutcheson argued is that his experiences and moral sense find this to be the case.

To the criticism that a person’s moral sense might be judged good or evil, Hutcheson replied that this was not possible. He compared judging the moral sense as good or evil with calling the “power of tasting, sweet or bitter; or of seeing, strait or crooked, white or black” (ibid. I. 409). So a person cannot have a morally evil moral sense even if this person disagrees with another. Hutcheson did see that people may differ in taste—and various people could and do—and that the moral sense can be silenced or ignored (ibid. 410). He contended, however, that these differences in taste and evaluation do not indicate evil in the moral sense itself.

Hutcheson did address the issue of uniformity in moral sentiments by answering whether or not we can know others will also approve of that which we approve (ibid. IV. 414). Though there is no certainty of agreement, the moral sense as natural to humankind is largely uniform. Hutcheson added that God approves of benevolence and kindness and so he created human nature with the capability to make the same types of approvals, and this is done by the moral sense. Our moral sense naturally, according to Hutcheson, approves of kindness and caring for others, and unless there is a prejudiced view of whether the action is truly kind and publicly useful, it is not probable that a person would judge incorrectly (ibid.). So, yes, there is disagreement sometimes, but the disagreement is not rooted in self-interest.

c. Basis of Moral Determinations

For Hutcheson, the foundation of our moral determinations is not self-love. What is basic to morality is our inclination for benevolence—an integral part of our moral evaluations which will be more fully examined in the following section. In response to the Hobbesian doctrine of egoism as advanced by authors like Bernard Mandeville, Hutcheson set out to prove the existence of natural feelings like benevolence in order to show that not every action was performed out of self-interest. Although the following quote demonstrates that Hutcheson worried that our natural benevolence could get caught up with our selfish nature, he hoped people could realize that our natural benevolence will allow us to see the higher character and that we can understand and encourage what is best for everyone:

Let the misery of excessive selfishness, and all its passions, be but once explain’d, that so self-love may cease to counteract our natural propensity to benevolence, and when this noble disposition gets loose from these bonds of ignorance, and false views of interest, it shall be assisted even by self-love, and grow strong enough to make a noble virtuous character. Then he is to enquire, by reflection upon human affairs, what course of action does most effectually promote the universal good… (Hutcheson 1725, VII. 155).

However, even when selfishness drowns out our benevolent instincts, our moral sense still operates in response to what is good for others.

Hutcheson’s moral sense theory helped to conceptually circumvent the problems that stem from a strict doctrine of egoism. He claimed that it is natural for us to want good things for others. When someone’s moral sense operates and they judge an action as morally wrong, the moral sense is not why they feel the wrongness, it is how they feel it. It is like an applause meter that evaluates the morality that is expressed in the sentiment: “I morally disapprove of that.” This last statement is a report of the moral sense into an opinion of morality, moving from a feeling to an idea. Yet, if the moral sense faculty works the way Hutcheson describes, there needs to be an innate benevolence, and that case is made by Hutcheson.

4. Benevolence: Response to Hobbes and Pufendorf

Hutcheson’s arguments for an instinctual benevolence are in both Reflections on the Common Systems of Morality (1724) and the Inaugural Lecture on the Nature of Man (1730), both found in Francis Hutcheson: Two Texts on Human Nature (Mautner 1993). In these texts Hutcheson responds to both Thomas Hobbes and Samuel Pufendorf, arguing that from our own experiences we can see that there are, in fact, disinterested motivations common in humankind. Hutcheson specifically claims that the term ‘state of nature’ as used by Hobbes and Pufendorf creates a misunderstanding of what is actually present in human nature. The actual ‘state of nature,’ for Hutcheson, includes the benevolence he claimed as instinctual to humankind. The particular Pufendorf claim that Hutcheson was concerned with was that people would not be virtuous unless they believed in divine punishment and reward (Mautner 1993, 18). This is not unlike Hobbes, who claimed that without civil authority, life for humankind would be “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short” (Hobbes 1651, 13.8). For both Hobbes and Pufendorf, the natural ‘state of nature’ is unappealing and full of egoistic defensive protections against others. In opposition, Hutcheson claims the nature of humankind as created by God includes a natural instinct for benevolence. Hutcheson considered the state of nature as described by Hobbes and Pufendorf as an uncultivated state (Hutcheson 1730, 132). He described the cultivated state as one in which a person’s mind is actively learning and developing. These cultivated persons are, for Hutcheson, truly following their own nature as designed by God. In this cultivated state, persons take care of themselves and want all of humankind to be safe and sound (Hutcheson 1730, 133). Hutcheson would have preferred that Hobbes and Pufendorf had used a term other than ‘state of nature’—perhaps ‘state of freedom’—to describe the uncultivated state. This may seem like an unimportant distinction, but consider it for a moment: if humankind is naturally as Hobbes and Pufendorf described, then they need to be forced to develop in cooperative ways, which would be against their nature. If humankind were by nature caring of others, as Hutcheson proposed, then individuals would not need to be forced to cooperate.

Besides the label, ‘state of nature,’ Hutcheson had other objections to the negative characterization of humankind ascribed by Pufendorf and Hobbes. Surely we experience other aspects of people that are not cruel or selfish. We also experience in ourselves a caring and a concern for others. Hutcheson wondered why there was no attention or acknowledgement given by Hobbes or Pufendorf to people’s natural propensity and:

kind instinct [s] to associate; of natural affections, of compassion, of love of company, a sense of gratitude, a determination to honour and love the authors of any good offices toward any part of mankind, as well as of those toward our selves… (Hutcheson 1724, 100).

These characteristics, for Hutcheson, are certainly a part of what we experience in ourselves and in others. We reach out to people for friendship and are impressed and grateful to people who kindly help others as well as ourselves.

Hutcheson also added that human beings naturally care what others think of them. He described this characteristic, observed in others and experienced in ourselves, as “a natural delight men take in being esteemed and honoured by others for good actions…” These characteristics, “all may be observed to prevail exceedingly in humane life,” are ones that we witness daily in people, and are ignored and therefore unaccounted for by Hobbes and Pufendorf (Hutcheson 1724, 100-1). Here, Hutcheson took care to describe his own experiences, and those of others for whom caring for others is not uncommon, and yet these characteristics are missing in the Hobbesian model of humankind. And it is not a meek or quiet instinct: “we shall find one of the greatest springs of their [men in general] actions to be love toward others…a strong delight in being honoured by others for kind actions…” (Hutcheson 1724, 101). Along with his disagreement with the Hobbesian characteristics of humankind, Hutcheson also discusses whether all human action comes from self-interest, arguing against psychological egoism. Hutcheson acknowledged that it is in everyone’s advantage to form cooperative units and that this interdependence is necessary for mankind’s survival (Hutcheson 1730, 134-5). This view agrees partially with what is referred to as prudentialism, as discussed by Hobbes and Pufendorf. Prudentialism is the theory that all cooperation and sociability comes from a self-interested motive. So people make friends or are kind because they know in the long run the effort will benefit their projects and survival—it is prudent to at least feign to care for others. Where Hutcheson disagreed with Hobbes and Pufendorf was over the claim that self-interest is the only motive for social life and/or caring for others. Hutcheson claimed that human beings have other natural affections and appetites “immediately implanted by nature, which are not directed towards physical pleasures or advantage but towards certain higher things which in themselves depend on associating with others” (Hutcheson 1730, 135).

Hutcheson could not imagine a rational creature sufficiently satisfied or happy in a state that would not include love and friendship with others. Hutcheson allowed that this person could have all the pleasant sensations of the external senses along with “the perceptions of beauty, order, harmony.” But that wouldn’t be enough (ibid. V. 144).  When discussing the pleasures of wealth and other external pleasures, Hutcheson connected the enjoyments of these with our experiences and involvement with others. For Hutcheson, even in an imaginary state of wealth, we include others. Hutcheson asked whether these kinds of ideas of wealth do not always include “some moral enjoyments of society, some communication of pleasure, something of love, of friendship, of esteem, of gratitude” (ibid. VI.147). Hutcheson asked more directly, “Who ever pretended to a taste of these pleasures without society” (ibid. VI. 147). So even in our imagination, while enjoying great wealth and material success, we are doing so in the company of others.

There is another minor disagreement between Hobbes and Hutcheson over what is considered funny, specifically what makes us laugh. Though taking up only small sections in Hobbes’ Human Nature (9. 13) and Leviathan (I.6.42), Hobbes’ claim that infirmity causes laughter was addressed by Hutcheson in “Thoughts [Reflections] on Laughter and Observations on ‘The Fable of the Bees.’” In this collection of six letters, Hutcheson also addresses his disagreements with Mandeville.  These letters, though not as well known today, could well have been quite influential essays when they were published originally in the Dublin Journal. They are also an excellent illustration of Hutcheson’s skills in argumentation.

5. Influences on Hume and Smith 

The moral sentimentalist theories of David Hume and Adam Smith were able to move past the Hobbesian view of human nature as both men considered Hutcheson to have handily defeated Hobbes’ argument. Hume does not take on Hobbes directly as he explains that “[m]any able philosophers have shown the insufficiency of these systems” (EPM, Appendix 2.6.17). Without Hutcheson’s successful argument for natural benevolence in human nature, Hume’s and Smith’s moral theories were not feasible because an innate care and concern for others and for society are both basic to their theories.

As a professor at the University of Glasgow, Hutcheson taught Smith, and his writings influenced both Smith and Hume by setting the empirical and psychological tone for both of their moral theories. Hutcheson particularly set up Hume’s moral theory in three ways. Hutcheson argued—as far as Hume was concerned, successfully—against humankind being completely self-interested. Hutcheson also described the mechanism of the internal moral sense that generates moral sentiments (although Hume’s description differed slightly, the mechanism in Hume’s account has many of the same characteristics). In connection to these two Hutcheson themes (the argument against human beings as solely self-interested and a moral sense wherein moral sentiments are felt), Hutcheson also made an argument for a naturally occurring instinct of benevolence in humankind. It was with these three Hutcheson themes that Hume and Smith began articulating their respective moral theories.

It is impossible to know how much Smith was influenced by Hutcheson. Many of Smith’s theories, especially concerning government regulations, property rights and unalienable rights, certainly resemble those espoused by Hutcheson. These were all addressed in the second treatise of the Inquiry (sections v-vii), where Hutcheson aligns the naturally occurring benevolence with feelings of honor, shame and pity, and with the evaluations of the moral sense—and also explains the way benevolence affects human affairs and the happiness of others. Smith’s ideas in Wealth of Nations align with Hutcheson on such issues as the division of labor and the compatibility of the amount and difficulty of labor with its value. Smith was also influenced by Hutcheson’s discussion of the cost of goods being dependent on the difficulty of acquiring them plus the demand for them (Systems II. 10. 7). Also of note in the same chapter is an insightful description for the use of coinage, gold and silver in the exchange of goods and the role of government in the use of coins. Overall, Hutcheson’s timely and meticulous attention to these kinds of social, economic and political details was not only instrumental to Smith’s development but also to that of the American colonies. The latter could have resulted specifically from Hutcheson’s A Short Introduction to Moral Philosophy being translated from Latin into English and used at American universities such as Yale.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Hutcheson

  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1724. Reflections on the Common Systems of Morality. In Francis Hutcheson: On Human Nature, ed. Thomas Mautner, 1993. 96-106. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Hutcheson, Francis. Philosophical Writings, ed. R. S. Downie. Everyman’s Library. 1994. London: Orion Publishing Group.
  • Hutcheson’s Writings (selection) ed. John McHugh in the Library of Scottish Philosophy series ed. Gordon Graham. Forthcoming 2014
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1725. An Inquiry Concerning the Original of Our Ideas of Virtue or Moral Good. Selections reprinted in British Moralists, ed. L. A. Selby –Bigge, 1964. 69-177. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1728. Illustrations upon the Moral Sense. Selections reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 403-418. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1730. Inaugural Lecture on the Social Nature of Man. In Francis Hutcheson: On Human Nature, ed. Thomas Mautner. 1993. 124-147. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1742. An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections. Selections reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 392-402. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
  • Hutcheson, Francis. 1755. A System of Moral Philosophy. Selection reprinted in British moralists, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge. 1964. 419-425. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.

i. Collected Works and Correspondence

  • Liberty Fund Natural Law and Enlightenment series: General Editor, Knud Haakonssen. Liberty Fund, Indianapolis, Indiana U.S.A.
  • 1725 An Inquiry into the Original of Our ideas of Beauty and Virtue. 2004
  • 1742 An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections, with the Illustrations on the Moral Sense. 2002
  • 1742 Logic, Metaphysics, and the Natural Sociability of Mankind. 2006
  • 1745 (Translated into English 1747) Philosophiae Moralis Instituitio Compendiaria with A Short Introduction to Moral Philosophy. ed. Luigi Turco. 2007
  • 1755 Meditations of the Emperor Marcus Aurelius Antonius. 2008
  • 1729 “Thoughts on Laughter and Observations on ‘The Fable of the Bees’” in The Correspondence and Occasional Writings of Francis Hutcheson  2014

b. Secondary Readings

  • Berry, Christopher J. 2003. “Sociality and Socialization.” The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment, ed. Alexander Broadie, Cambridge University Press.
  • Blackstone, William T. 1965. Francis Hutcheson & Contemporary Ethical Theory. University of Georgia Press.
  • Broadie, Alexander, ed. 2003. The Cambridge Companion to the Scottish Enlightenment. Cambridge University Press.
  • Brown, Michael. 2002. Francis Hutcheson in Dublin 1719-1730: The Crucible of his Thought. Four Courts Press.
  • Carey, Daniel. 1999. Hutcheson. In The Dictionary of Eighteenth-Century British Philosophers, eds. John Yolton, John Valdimir Price, and John Stephens. Two volumes.Vol. II: 453-460. Bristol, England: Thoemmes Press.
  • D’Arms, Justin and Daniel Jacobson. 2000. Sentiment and Value. In Ethics 110 (July): 722-748. The University of Chicago.
  • Daniels, Norman and Keith Lehrer. Eds. 1998. Philosophical Ethics. Dimensions of Philosophy Series. Boulder, Colorado: Westview Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen. 1995. The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’ 1640 – 1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Darwell, Stephen, Allan Gibbard, and Peter Railton, eds.1997. Moral Discourse and Practice. Oxford University Press.
  • Emmanuel, Steven, ed. 2001. The Blackwell Guide to the Modern Philosophers. Massachusetts: Blackwell Press.
  • Gill, Michael. 1996. Fantastic Associations and Addictive General Rules: A fundamental difference between Hutcheson and Hume. Hume Studies vol. XXII, no. 1 (April): 23-48.
  • Graham, Gordon. 2001. Morality and Feeling in the Scottish Enlightenment. Philosophy. Volume 76.
  • Haakonssen, Knud. 1996. Natural Law and Moral Philosophy: From Grotius to the Scottish Enlightenment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Haakonssen, Knud. 1998. Adam Smith. Aldershot, England: Dartmouth Publishing Company Limited and Ashgate Publishing Limited.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 2000. Explaining Value. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Herman, Arthur. 2002. How the Scots Invented the Modern World: The True story of How Western Europe’s Poorest Nation Created Our World. Broadway Books.
  • Hope, Vincent. 1989. Virtues by Consensus: The Moral Philosophy of Hutcheson, Hume, and Adam Smith. Oxford University Press.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. 1651. Leviathan, ed. Edwin Curley. 1994. Indiana, USA: Hackett Press.
  • Hobbes, Thomas. 1651. Human Nature: or the Fundamental Elements of Policy. In British Moralists, ed. D.D. Raphael, 1991. Pp. 3-17. Indiana USA: Hackett Press.
  • Hume, David. 1740. A Treatise of Human Nature, eds. L. A. Selby-Bigge and P. H. Nidditch. second edition, 1978. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hume, David. 1751. Enquiries Concerning the Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals, eds. L. A. Selby-Bigge and P. H. Nidditch. Revised third edition, 1975. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • LaFollette, Hugh, ed. 2000. The Blackwell Guide to Ethical Theory. Massachusetts: Blackwell Publishers.
  • LaFollette, Hugh. 1991. The truth in Ethical Relativism. Journal of Social Philosophy. 146-54.
  • Kivy, Peter. 2003. The Seventh Sense: A Study of Francis Hutcheson’s Aesthetics and Its Influence in Eighteenth-Century Britain. 2nd edition. New York: Franklin.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1998. The Subjectivity of Values. In Ethical Theories, third edition, ed. Louis Pojman. 518 – 537.Wadworth Publishing.
  • Mautner, Thomas, ed. 1993. Francis Hutcheson: Two Texts on Human Nature. Cambridge University Press.
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Author Information

Phyllis Vandenberg
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.


Abigail DeHart
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.

Bernard Mandeville (1670—1733)

Bernard Mandeville is primarily remembered for his impact on discussions of morality and economic theory in the early eighteenth century. His most noteworthy and notorious work is The Fable of the Bees, which triggered immense public criticism at the time. He had a particular influence on philosophers of the Scottish Enlightenment, most notably Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Adam Smith. The Fable’s overall influence on the fields of ethics and economics is, perhaps, one of the greatest and most provocative of all early-eighteenth century English works.

The controversy sparked by the Fable was over Mandeville’s proposal that vices, such as vanity and greed, result in publically beneficial results. Along the same lines, he proposed that many of the actions commonly thought to be virtuous were, instead, self-interested at their core and therefore vicious. He was a critic of moral systems that claimed humans had natural feelings of benevolence toward one another, and he instead focused attention on self-interested passions like pride and vanity that led to apparent acts of benevolence. This caused his readers to imagine him to be a cruder reincarnation of Thomas Hobbes, particularly as a proponent of egoism. What follows is an overview of Mandeville’s life and influence, paying specific attention to his impact on discussions of morality and economic theory.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Fable of the Bees
  3. The Private Vice, Public Benefit Paradox
  4. The Egoist “Culprit”
  5. On Charity
  6. Influence on Economic Theory
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Mandeville
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Mandeville was born in 1670 to a distinguished family in the Netherlands, either in or nearby Rotterdam. His father was a physician, as was his great-grandfather, a factor that, no doubt, influenced his own educational path in medicine at the University of Leyden, receiving his M.D. in 1691. He also held a baccalaureate in philosophy, and wrote his dissertation defending the Cartesian doctrine that animal bodies are mere automata because they lack immaterial souls.

Mandeville moved to England some time after the Glorious Revolution of 1688, and it was here he settled permanently, married, and had at least two children. His first published works in English were anonymous pieces in 1703 entitled The Pamphleteers: A Satyr and Some Fables after the Easie and Familiar Method of Monsieur de la Fontaine. In the first, Mandeville defends against those “pamphleteers” who were criticizing both the Glorious Revolution and the late King William III. In Some Fables, he translated twenty-seven of La Fontaine’s Fables, adding two of his own in the same comic style as employed in his later Grumbling Hive.

Although Dr. Mandeville supported his family through his work as a physician, he was also engaged in many literary-political activities. His political interests were not directly obvious until 1714 when he published a piece of political propaganda, The Mischiefs that Ought Justly to be Apprehended from a Whig-Government, which demonstrates his support for the Whig party. Throughout his life, he published numerous smaller works and essays, most of them containing harsh social criticism. Published in 1720, Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church and National Happiness was his final party political tract in which he endorses the advantages of Whig governance as well as advancing a skeptical view of the religious establishment and priestcraft.

Mandeville still continued to publish other provocative pieces, for example: A Modest Defence of Publick Stews (1724), containing controversial plans which would create public housing for prostitution. Within this piece he argued that the best societal solution was to legalize prostitution and regulate it under strict government supervision. Mandeville’s most notable and notorious work, however, was The Fable of the Bees; it began as an anonymous pamphlet of doggerel verse in 1705, entitled The Grumbling Hive: Or, Knaves Turn’d Honest. More is known of Mandeville’s writings than of his life, and so it is most useful to turn to The Fable for a further examination of his history.

2. The Fable of the Bees

It is rare that a poem finds its way into serious philosophical discussion, as The Grumbling Hive: or, Knaves Turn’d Honest has done. Written in the style of his previous fables, the 433-line poem served as the foundation for Mandeville’s principal work: The Fable of the Bees: or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits. The Fable grew over a period of twenty-four years, eventually reaching its final, sixth edition in 1729. In this work, Mandeville gives his analysis of how private vices result in public benefits like industry, employment and economic flourishing. Interpreted by his contemporaries as actively promoting vice as the singular explanation and precondition for a thriving economic society, this central analysis was the primary reason for Mandeville’s reputation as a scandalous libertine. This was a misreading of Mandeville’s position. Most of the work he later produced was either an expansion or defense of the Fable in the light of contemporary opposition.

The Grumbling Hive poem is a short piece, later published as just a section of the larger Fable, which was mostly comprised as a series of commentaries upon the 1705 poem. It immediately introduces its reader to a spacious and luxurious hive of bees. This hive was full of vice, “Yet the whole mass a paradise” (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 31). The society flourished in many ways, but no trade was without dishonesty. Oddly, the worst cheats of the hive were those who complained most about this dishonesty and fraud so plaguing their society. Here the poem dramatically turns as “all the rogues cry’d brazenly, Good gods, had we but honesty!” (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 33) Jove, the bees’ god, angrily rid the hive of all vice, but the results were catastrophic as the newly virtuous bees were no longer driven to compete with one another. As a result, industry collapsed, and the once flourishing society was destroyed in battle, leaving few bees remaining. These bees, to avoid the vices of ease and extravagance, flew into a hollow tree in a contented honesty.

The implication of the poem is clear for the beehive, but perhaps not for humanity: it seems paradoxical to suggest that a society is better when it promotes a culture characterized by private vice. However, it is precisely this paradox on which Mandeville draws to make his larger point. The “Moral” at the end of the poem claims, “Fools only strive To make a Great an’ honest Hive.”(The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 36) Mandeville thought the discontent over moral corruptness, or the private vice of society, was either hypocritical or incoherent, as such vice served an indispensable role in the economy by stimulating trade, industry and upward economic improvement i.e., public benefit. The desire to create a purely virtuous society was based on “a vain EUTOPIA seated in the Brain”: fancying that a nation can, with virtues like honesty, attain great wealth and success, when in fact it is the desire to improve one’s material condition in acts of self-indulgence that lies at the heart of economic productivity (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 36).

The poem’s humorous ending demonstrates that vice can look surprisingly like virtue if implemented correctly. To Mandeville’s readers this was a deeply offensive conclusion to draw, and yet for almost twenty years his work went largely unnoticed. In 1714, Mandeville published the Fable of the Bees, presented as a series of “Remarks” offering an extended commentary upon the original “The Grumbling Hive”, and intended to explain and elucidate the meaning of the earlier poem. But the Fable initially garnered little attention. It was not until a second edition in 1723, featuring a new addition, “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools”, that Mandeville gained the notoriety that would make him infamous amongst his contemporaries. The 1723 edition soon prompted reproach from the public, and was even presented before the Grand Jury of Middlesex and there declared a public nuisance. The presentment of the Jury claimed that the Fable intended to disparage religion and virtue as detrimental to society, and to promote vice as a necessary component of a well-functioning state. Though never censored, the book and author achieved sudden disrepute, and the Fable found itself the subject of conversation amongst clergymen, journalists, and philosophers.

3. The Private Vice, Public Benefit Paradox

Rather than giving a lengthy argument proving that private vice can be useful, Mandeville illustrates in the Fable that vice can be disguised, and yet is necessary in the attainment of collective goods, thus resulting in a paradox of “private vices, public benefits”. For instance, and to take one of Mandeville’s central examples, pride is a vice, and yet without pride there would be no fashion industry, as individuals would lack the motivation to buy new and expensive clothes with which to try and impress their peers. If pride were eradicated tomorrow, the result would leave hundreds of companies bankrupt, prompt mass unemployment, risk the collapse of industry, and in turn devastate both the economic security and with it the military power of the British commercial state. Similarly, and on a smaller scale, without thieves there would be no locksmiths, without quarrels over property, no lawyers, and so on.

Crucially, however, Mandeville did not claim a paradox of private vice, public virtue. The “benefits” that arose from individually vicious actions were morally compromised due to their being rooted in private self-seeking- one of Mandeville’s starkest challenges to his contemporaries, and a point which makes his fundamental philosophical commitments difficult to interpret. It is still disputed as to what, exactly, Mandeville thought the relation between private vice and public benefit should be: was he merely holding up a mirror to a corrupt society, satirizing those who claimed commercial opulence was straightforwardly compatible with virtue? Or did he seriously believe that modern commercial states should abandon their luxurious comforts for austere self-denial, so as to escape the paradox he alleged? Whatever the case, his notoriety arose from placing the two together, a little too closely for most of his readers’ taste and comfort. Mandeville’s paradox alleged, unapologetically, the tendency of men to hide vices behind socially acceptable forms of behavior, thereby appearing virtuous.  On the one hand, Mandeville wished to imply that common sense views are not as reliant on common sense as they first appear: what looks like virtuous behavior may in fact be disguised selfishness. On the other, those who preach virtue may turn out to be deluded hypocrites: real virtue would mean the collapse of all the benefits that supervene on private vice. Chief amongst Mandeville’s targets was Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury, who claimed that a large-scale flourishing commercial society was compatible with individuals securing virtue by engaging in rational self-restraint whilst enjoying the benefits of economic advancement. For Mandeville, this was incorrect and preposterous: society could be prosperous and based on private vices, or poor and based on private virtues- but not both.

4. The Egoist “Culprit”

Mandeville’s psychological examination of humankind, often perceived as cynical, is a large part of his genius and also his infamy. Much in keeping with the physician he was, it is fitting that he took on the task of diagnosing society in order to expose what he believed to be the true motives of humankind. Nonetheless, there was a religious component in Mandeville’s thought. His man was necessarily fallen man: capable only of pleasing himself, the individual human being was a postlapsarian creature, irredeemably selfish and greedy for its own private pleasure, at which it always aimed even if it hid such self-seeking behind more respectable facades (The Fable, Vol. I, pg. 348). Mandeville’s examination showed the ways in which people hid their real thoughts and motives behind a mask in order to fake sociability by not offending the selfish pride of their peers. Ironically, Mandeville’s own honesty led him into trouble: he boldly claimed vice was inevitably the foundation of a thriving society, insofar as all human beings had to act viciously because their status as selfish fallen men ensured that whatever displays they affected, at bottom selfishness always dictated their actions. All social virtues are evolved from self-love, which is at the core irredeemably vicious. Mandeville also challenged conventional moral terminology by taking a term like “vice” and showing that, despite its negative connotations, it was beneficial to society at large.

In its time, most responses to the Fable were designed as refutations (and understandably so, as few desired association with Mandeville’s central thesis) mainly focused on its analysis of the foundations of morality. To many, Mandeville was on par with Thomas Hobbes in promoting a doctrine of egoism which threatened to render all putative morality a function of morally-compromised selfishness. This accusation comes, in part, from “An Enquiry into the Origin of Moral Virtue” (1723) where Mandeville first proposes his theory of the skillful politician. Whether genuine theory, or more of Mandeville’s playful satirizing, the “Enquiry” was a provocative analysis designed to call into question contemporary notions of virtue. According to Mandeville, skillful politicians originally flattered the masses into believing that actions were vicious when done in order to gratify selfish passions, and virtuous when they were performed in contrast with immediate impulse of nature to acquire private pleasure, by instead suppressing this urge temporarily so as not to offend or harm others. But Mandeville’s central contention was that that no action was virtuous when inspired by selfish emotions. When men learned to temporarily suppress their urges for pleasure, they did not act from virtue. What they really did was find innovative ways to better secure their private pleasures, by engaging in forms of socially-sanctioned behavior they were flattered for- thus securing a more advanced form of pleasure than would be had by simply glorying over their peers in immediate displays of selfishness. Because he considered all natural human passions to be selfish, no action could be virtuous if it was done from a natural impulse which would itself be necessarily selfish. Accordingly, a human could not perform a virtuous act without some form of self-denial. Skillful politicians invented a sort of quasi-morality by which to control naturally selfish men- but because this involved the redirection of natural passion, not active self-denial, at root this was vice. The upshot of Mandeville’s vision was that excepting acts of Christian virtue assisted directly by God, all human actions were vicious and thus morally compromised. Unsurprisingly, this view of human nature was thought to be cynical and degrading, which is why he was often categorized with Hobbes, usually by critics of both, as a proponent of the serious egoist system denying the reality of moral distinctions.

Many critical reactions followed Mandeville’s depiction of humankind as selfish and unruly. He was often understood to deny the reality of virtue, with morality being merely the invention of skillful politicians in order to tame human passions. As Mandeville’s analysis of human nature developed throughout his life, he increasingly placed more emphasis on the peculiarity of human passions. His central estimation is that humankind is filled and predominantly governed by the passion of pride, and even when one seems to be acting contrarily, he or she is doing so out of some form of self-interest. He spends a considerable amount of time satirizing “polite” societies whose members imagine their actions to be entirely benevolent. Statements like “Pride and Vanity have built more Hospitals than all the Virtues together” are used to point out the real motives behind seemingly charitable actions (The Fable, Vol. 1, pg. 294). Pride is central to Mandeville’s analysis because it accounts for human actions performed in order to appear selfless to gain public honor, but which can be made into public benefits. It takes the central role in the skillful politician’s plan to socialize humanity through flattery, offering honor as an ever-renewable prize to anyone who would deny his or her immediate self-interest for the sake of another.

For Mandeville, one problem that arose from this account was over the exact role of skillful politicians in mankind’s societal development. How could it be, if men were only able to please themselves, that some (these skillful politicians) could know enough to control others by instigating a system of social virtues? The second volume of the Fable was written to elucidate difficulties such as these and to explain several things “that were obscure and only hinted at in the First.” (The Fable, Vol. II, pg. vi) To accomplish this task, he fashioned six dialogues between interlocutors Cleomenes, who was an advocate for the Fable, and Horatio, described as one who found great delight in Lord Shaftesbury’s writings. These dialogues provided, among other topics, an explanation of how humankind transitioned from its original state of unrestrained self-pleasing into a complex functioning society. Pride was still central to this analysis, but because of the intricacy and confusion behind such a word as pride, Mandeville introduced a helpful distinction between “self-love” and “self-liking”. Self-liking was identified as the cause of pride and shame and accounted for the human need to gain approval from others, whereas self-love referred to material needs of the body; he asserted that the seeds of politeness were lodged within self-love and self-liking.

In part, this distinction came as response to Joseph Butler who claimed that Mandeville’s version of psychological egoism fell apart upon application. By seeking to reduce the consequences that stemmed from Mandeville’s exposure of the hypocrisy of acting for public benefit, Butler argued the compatibility of self-love and benevolence. He did this by making self-love a general, not a particular passion and in doing so, he made the object of self-love happiness. Happiness, then, would be entirely in the interest of moral subjects. Butler held that self-love was compatible with benevolence because calculating long-term interests led to virtuous action. To Mandeville, however, this avoided the main point by failing to ask the central ethical question: how the distinction between moral and non-moral action can be made if moral acts are indistinguishable from self-interested ones. This second volume of the Fable dismisses many of Butler’s criticisms as ignorant, but Mandeville did realize that his notion of pride needed to be re-conceptualized because it was a loaded term and yet was central to his estimation. According to Mandeville, Butler’s error –leading him to claim Mandeville’s system collapsed incoherently– was failing to recognize that men first had to like themselves, but could only do so through other’s recognition and then approbation. Mandeville upheld that self-love is given to all for self-preservation, but we cannot love what we dislike and so we must genuinely like our own being. He alleged that nature caused us to value ourselves above our real worth and so in order to confirm the good opinions we have of ourselves, we flock together to have these notions affirmed. He wrote, “an untaught Man would desire every body that came near him, to agree with him in the Opinion of his superiour Worth, and be angry, as far as his Fear would let him, with all that should refuse it: He would be highly delighted with, and love every body, whom he thought to have a good Opinion of him” (The Fable, Vol. II, pg. 138-9). So, he thought even in an instance where a group of men was fully fed, within less than a half an hour self-liking would lead to a desire for superiority in some way, be it through strength, cunning, or some other grander quality.

Mandeville thought introducing the distinction between “self-liking” and “self-love” rectified confusions over the role of pride. Humans have a deeply rooted psychological need for approbation, and this can drive us to ensure we truly possess the qualities we admire in others. In fact, he claimed self-liking is so necessary to beings who indulge it that people can taste no pleasure without it. Mandeville gives an example of the extremities of this need­­ by claiming self-liking can even drive one to suicide if he or she fails to receive the approbation of others. Still, Mandeville maintains that because our motivation is for the pleasure of a good opinion of ourselves along with a good reputation, our achievement of virtuous character traits, even if genuinely desired, is not true virtue. The motivation is selfish and, consequently, not virtuous.

A large part of Mandeville’s later work focused on critiquing theorists like Berkeley, Law, and Shaftesbury. He particularly criticized Shaftesbury who claimed that human benevolence was natural and that men could act disinterestedly without regard to pride. Mandeville opposed the search for this objective standard of morality as being no better than “a Wild-Goose-Chace that is little to be depended on” (The Fable, Vol. I, p. 331). He thought that impressing upon people that they could be virtuous without self-denial would be a “vast inlet to hypocrisy,” not only deceiving everyone else, but also themselves (The Fable, Vol. I, p. 331). Mandeville aimed to show that, by using his own rigorous and austere standards of morality, his opponents had never performed a virtuous act in their lives; furthermore, if everyone must live up to these ideals, it would mean the collapse of modern society. Thus by alleging the difficulty of achieving virtue and the usefulness of vice, his paradox seemed to set a trap. Francis Hutcheson took up this debate in defense of Shaftesbury in order to establish an alternate account of human virtue to show how humanity could naturally be virtuous by acting from disinterested benevolence. He found the Fable’s outcome detestable in that it reduced societal virtue to passion and claimed this constituted a comprehensive system of sociability. Hutcheson considered a proper moralist to be one who promoted virtue by demonstrating that it is within one’s own best interest to act virtuously. He argued, by constructing his theory of the moral sense, that virtue was pleasurable and in complete accordance with one’s nature. Still, even with this radical departure from Mandeville’s conclusions, both undoubtedly agreed that reason could not sufficiently supply a standard for action: one must begin with an examination of human nature.

Other philosophers took the Fable in a less outraged and condemnatory fashion than Hutcheson. Instead of agreeing with Mandeville that self-interest negated moral worth and attempting to show that human action could be entirely disinterested, Hume agreed with substantial aspects of his basic analysis, but pointed out that if good things result from vice, then there is something deeply incorrect in retaining the terminology of vice after all. Hume considered Hutcheson’s conclusion— that we give our approvals because we are pleased naturally by the actions we find virtuous— to be incorrect. Hume noted, much like Mandeville, that our sense of duty or morality solely occurs in civilization, and he aligns himself more closely with Mandeville than Hutcheson when accounting for human sociability.

It is, perhaps, through Jean-Jacques Rousseau that Mandeville’s naturalistic account of human sociability found its most important messenger. In 1756, Adam Smith, in his review of Rousseau’s Discourse on the Origins of Inequality remarked how Mandeville’s second volume of the Fable gave occasion to Rousseau’s system. Rousseau and Mandeville both deny the natural sociability of man and equally stress the gradual evolution of society. For Rousseau, mankind was endowed with pity, or a “natural repugnance at seeing any other sensible being and particularly any of our own species, suffer pain or death” (Discourse on the Origins of Inequality). This pity or compassion plays a large part in modifying amour de soi-même (self-respect) and making it humane. He saw this passion as a natural and acknowledged that Mandeville agreed. What Mandeville failed to see, thought Rousseau, was that from this pity came all of the other societal virtues.

Smith was also influenced by Mandeville, but likewise disagreed with the supposition that people are wholly selfish, and his Theory of Moral Sentiments spends considerable time debunking the positions of Hobbes and Mandeville accordingly. Smith was able to circumvent this purely self-interested account by drawing on the role of sympathy. He supposed the whole account of self-interest as found in Hobbes’s and Mandeville’s systems caused such commotion in the world because of misapprehensions on the role of sympathy. Smith determined that an operational system of morals was partly based on its capacity to account for a good theory of fellow feeling. So, for example, Mandeville claimed that one’s motivation to help a beggar on the streets would stem from passions like pity that govern humankind: to walk away from someone in need would raise pity within one’s self in such way as to cause psychological harm, and therefore any help given would be performed in order to relieve the unease of seeing another in suffering.

Smith also considered Mandeville’s claim that humans only associated with one another to receive pleasure from the esteem they sought. While Smith did not wholly accept this, they both agreed about the enticing nature of public praise and that it can, at times, be a more powerful desire than accumulation of money. Smith responds directly to Mandeville on this point in the Theory of Moral Sentiments, paying particular attention to Mandeville’s account of the role of pride. Smith rejects Mandeville’s contention that all public spirit and self-sacrifice are merely clever ways to receive the praise of society. He gets around this by drawing a distinction between the desire to become praise-worthy, which is not vice, and the desire of frivolous praise for anything whatsoever. He claims there is a tricky similarity between the two that has been exaggerated by Mandeville, but the distinction is made by separating vanity from the love of true glory. Both are passions, but one is reasonable while the other is ridiculous. Significantly, though, Smith never lays to rest the importance of motivation to one’s overall actions and acknowledges how there are alternate motivations to act which employ both the role of sympathy and self-interest, e.g., one may donate out of some true feeling from sympathy, all the while knowing the move is socially advantageous. Smith gives some praise to Mandeville’s licentious system, because even though it was ultimately incorrect, it could not have made so much noise in the world if it had not, in some way, bordered upon truth. Smith noted it was because of Mandeville’s clever, yet misplaced analysis of human nature that people began to feel the connection between economic activity and human desire.

5. On Charity

In Mandeville’s “Vindication” of the Fable, he proposed that the reason for its sudden popularity may have been his “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools” (1723). In this essay Mandeville took his theory from fable to applied social criticism as he claimed that charity is often mistook for pity and compassion. Pity and compassion, as opposed to charity, can be traced back to a desire to think well of one’s self. This “charity”, then, would not be virtuous action but vicious, and therefore worthy of examination. To say Mandeville was unpopular for writing against the formation of charity schools would be an understatement: charity schools were highly regarded and were the most popular form of benevolence in eighteenth-century England. Initiated near the end of the seventeenth century, they were the predominant form of education for the poor. Donning a charitable temperature, these schools provided ways to impose virtuous qualities into the minds of poor children. The common attitude toward these children was rather derogatory and often depicted them as “rough” because they came from pickpockets, idlers and beggars of society. The curriculum within charity schools was overtly religious, attempting to instill moral and religious habits so as to turn these children into polite members of society.

Bernard Mandeville opposed the formation of charity schools, and while his disagreement may seem harsh, it is a practical example of the kind of hypocrisy he contested. Mandeville challenged the use of the word “charity” in description of these schools, and claimed that they were formed not out of the virtue of charity, but out of the passion of pity. To him, passions like pity are acted upon to relieve one’s own self the unease of seeing another in suffering. He explains that, in order for an action to be virtuous, there must not be an impure motive. Acts performed on behalf of friends and family, or done in order to gain honor and public respect could not be charitable. If charity were reducible to pity, then charity itself would be an undiscriminating universal passion and be of no use to society. To him, charity schools were simply clever manifestations of pride. Beginning the essay with his own rigid definition of charity, Mandeville clearly intended to show that these schools were not worthy to be so entitled.

Mandeville argued pity and compassion were accounted for by human passions, and noted, that though it may seem odd, we are controlled by self-love that drives us to relieve these feelings. He drew a sketch of self-love and pity working together with his beggar example. Imagine a beggar on the streets appeals to you by explaining his situation, showing off his wound in need of medical attention, and then implores you to show virtue for Jesus Christ’s sake by giving him some money. His image raises within you a sense of pity, and you feel compelled to give him money. Mandeville claimed the beggar is a master in this art of capturing pity and makes his marks buy their peace. It is our self-love alone that motivates us to give money to this beggar, which cannot constitute an act of charity.

The part of the “Essay” that would have been truly offensive to those in Mandeville’s time comes when he turns accusations of villainy not to so-called objects of charity but to people with wealth and education. He attacks those of good reputation and claims that the reason they have this good reputation is that they have hidden their private vice behind public benefit. He compared charity schools to a vogue in the fashion of hooped petticoats, and pointed out no reason could be given for either. Moreover, he considered these schools to be pernicious, as they would weaken the established social hierarchies on which the British state depended. Charity schools were fashionable to support, but beyond this, Mandeville found little reason for their continuation.

Mandeville disagreed with the entire motivation behind charity schools, seeing them as nothing but a system where men he most opposed could impart their views onto following generations. Mandeville thought, as was common in his day, that people were born into their life stations and should seek to be content within them. He still considered charity to be necessary at times because the helpless should be looked after, but he believed the model of charity schools would only ever promote laziness in society. This view becomes less cynical when considering his support of economic activity as a solution. Mandeville approved of the growing industry and he saw economic advancements as necessary pieces to advancing civilization because standards were being raised, for example: today’s poor were living like yesterday’s rich. He alleged that British prosperity depended, in part, on exploiting the laboring poor, and so it was not the economic advancement he challenged, but rather the hypocrisy of individuals who thought that by their public benefit, they were advancing society. These citizens were acting out of self-love not charity, and if this could be realized, then instances like charity schools could be given over to the critical examination Mandeville thought they deserved.

6. Influence on Economic Theory

Mandeville’s defense of luxury stands amidst the forefront of economic discussions in the eighteenth century. While he charged that a state founded on selfishness is corrupt, he also showed that society must be based upon that selfishness and that no state can be great without embracing luxury. His argument that luxury was harmless to social (if not personal, spiritual) prosperity and necessary for economic flourishing flew in the face of traditional ascetic moral codes embedded in certain Christian teaching, as well as earlier republican political theory which claimed that luxury rendered a population impotent and corrupted individuals, leading to the internal decay of the polity and its vulnerability to external conquest.

Mandeville’s most prevalent influence on economic theory was through Adam Smith. Both of them by and large supported market-based systems of free resource allocation. Mandeville’s commanding point, which could not be ignored by future economists, was that without indulgence there would be little, if any, consumer spending. Mandeville certainly influenced Smith’s economic thought, as Smith picks up the private vice, public benefit paradox in order to claim that one of the original principles in human nature is to barter and trade for private advantage, which then propels commercial society forward resulting in economic advancement and prosperity. This paradox raised the question of whether self-interested action was vicious, and further proposed that by attending to one’s own needs, one could actually contribute to society in positive ways. In his Wealth of Nations, Smith borrowed largely from Mandeville’s earlier position on the usefulness of self-interested behavior, though he denied the scandalous implications Mandeville provided. It is speculated as to whether Smith inherited his invisible hand notion from the paradox Mandeville presented–although the phrase was never explicitly mentioned in Mandeville’s writing– because Smith mentions the invisible hand when he provides an example of unintended public interest brought about by intending one’s own gain. Influence is also found in the division of labor theory, which was one of Smith’s tenets of modern economic thought.

Most notably, Mandeville’s work contains the genealogical origins of laissez-faire economic theory- in particular as put forward by Friedrich von Hayek, one of the Fable’s keenest twentieth-century admirers. The similarity lies in Mandeville’s claim that self-seeking individuals will interact in mutually beneficial ways without being coordinated from above, while a natural check on their interactions will result in public benefit as the outcome. Interference with this self-seeking will pervert the balance- as alleged in the conclusion of the Grumbling Hive. Because of this notion of order emerging through voluntarily, unregulated activities, Hayek credits Mandeville as being one of the first to put forward the concept of “spontaneous order”. Using the same sort of language, Mandeville remarked, “how the short-sighted Wisdom, of perhaps well-meaning People, may rob us of a Felicity, that would flow spontaneously from the Nature of every large Society, if none were to divert or interrupt the Stream” (The Fable, Vol. II, p. 427). Hayek argued that instead of solely viewing Mandeville through the lens of a moral philosopher, we should see him as a great psychologist who may not have contributed much by way of answers, but certainly asked the right questions using an evolutionary approach to understand society. Hayek even goes so far as to claim that Darwin, in many respects, is the culmination of a development Mandeville started more than any other single person. This approach– rather than assuming society was the product of planning and conscious design by elites– helped spark new empirical explorations. Mandeville saw the sociability of man as arising from two things: the many desires he has, and the opposition met while attempting to satisfy these desires. He brings to the foreground the beneficial effects of luxury, and this was part of what interested John Maynard Keynes. In his General Theory, Keynes cited Mandeville as a source for his position in emphasizing the positive effects of consumption (aggregate demand). This stood in opposition to classical economics who held up production (aggregate supply) as the motor of economic growth.

While there was no systematic formulation of laissez-faire theory in Mandeville’s writing, it was an important literary source for the doctrine, namely, its analysis of human selfishness and the societal benefits ironically and unintentionally stemming therefrom. It is precisely through these attempts to reconcile the paradox of private vices, public benefits that we find some of the first leanings toward a modern utilitarian attitude. Accordingly, Mandeville is thought to be one its most fundamental and early philosophical influences, as transmitted in particular by David Hume and Adam Smith to Jeremy Bentham and then John Stuart Mill.

7. References and Further Reading

Bernard Mandeville was an outspoken and controversial author and an equally interesting character. He claims that he wrote mostly for his own entertainment, but the vast number of essays, poems, and stories he composed should, perhaps, be allowed to speak for themselves. The best modern edition and collection of Mandeville’s work is F.B. Kaye’s The Fable of the Bees. The textual references throughout the article were from Kaye’s Fable through the Online Library of Liberty (1988). The following list of Mandeville’s work is adapted from and indebted to Kaye’s own work on Bernard Mandeville.

a. Works by Mandeville

  • Bernandi a Mandeville de Medicina Oratorio Scholastica. Rotterdam: Typis Regneri Leers, 1685.
  • Disputatio Philosophica de Brutorum Operationibus. Leyden: Apud Abrahamum Elzevier, Academiae Typograph, 1689.
  • Disputatio Medica Inauguralis de Chylosi Vitiata. Leyden: Apud Abrahamum Elzevier, Academiae Typograph, 1691.
  • The Pamphleteers: A Satyr. London, 1703.
  • Some Fables after the Easie and Familiar Method of Monsieur de la Fontaine. London, 1703.
  • Aesop Dress’d; or a Collection of Fables Writ in Familiar Verse. By B. Mandeville, M.D. London: Printed for Richard Wellington, 1704.
  • Typhon: or The Wars Between the Gods and Giants; A Burlesque Poem in Imitation of the Comical Mons. Scarron. London: Printed for J. Pero & S. Illidge, and sold by J. Nutt, 1704.
  • The Grumbling Hive: or, Knaves Turn’d Honest. London: Printed for Sam. Ballard and sold by A. Baldwin, 1705.
  •  The Virgin Unmask’d: or, Female Dialogues Betwixt an Elderly Maiden Lady, and Her Niece, On Several Diverting Discourses on Love, Marriage, Memoirs, and Morals of the Times. London: Sold by J. Morphew & J. Woodward, 1709.
  • A Treatise of the Hypochondriack and Hysterick Passions, Vulgarly call’d the Hypo in Men and Vapours in Women… By B. de Mandeville, M.D. London: Printed for the author, D. Leach, W. Taylor & J. Woodward, 1711.
  • Wishes to a Godson, with Other Miscellany Poems, By B.M. London: Printed for J. Baker, 1712.
  • The Fable of the Bees: or, Private Vices, Publick Benefits. London: Printed for J. Roberts, 1714.
  • The Mischiefs that Ought Justly to be Apprehended from a Whig-Government. London: Printed for J. Roberts, 1714.
  • Free Thoughts on Religion, the Church and National Happiness, By B.M. London: Sold by T. Jauncy & J. Roberts, 1720.
  • A Modest Defence of Publick Stews… by a Layman. London: Printed by A. Moore, 1724.
  • An Enquiry into the Cause of the Frequent Executions at Tyburn… by B. Mandeville, M.D. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1725.
  • The Fable of the Bees. Part II. By the Author of the First. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1729.
  • An Enquiry into the Origin of Honour, and the Usefulness of Christianity in War. By the Author of the Fable of the Bees. London: Printed for J. Brotherton, 1732.
  • A Letter to Dion, Occasion’d by his Book call’d Alciphron or The Minute Philosopher. By the Author of the Fable of the Bees. London: Sold by J. Roberts, 1732.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Cook, H. J. “Bernard Mandeville and the Therapy of ‘The Clever Politician’” Journal of the History of Ideas 60 (1999): 101-124.
    • On the clever politicians’ manipulation of people’s passions to make politics run smoothly.
  • Goldsmith, M.M. Private Vices, Public Benefits: Bernard Mandeville’s Social and Political Thought. Christchurch, New Zealand: Cybereditions Corporation, 2001.
    • A helpful monograph of Mandeville’s ideas placed in context of eighteenth-century England’s political atmosphere.
  • Hayek, F.A. The Trend of Economic Thinking: Essays on Political Economists and Economic History Volume III. Taylor & Francis e-Library, 2005.
    • See Hayek’s chapter 6 devoted to what he sees as two important Mandevillean contributions to the history of economics.
  • Heath, E. “Mandeville’s Bewitching Engine of Praise” History of Philosophy Quarterly 15 (1998): 205-226.
    • Offers Mandeville’s account of human nature and how government arises from a state of nature. Also depicts Mandeville as one of the first defenders of commercial modernity.
  • Hont, I. “The early Enlightenment debate on commerce and luxury” The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Political Thought. 1st ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2006): 377-418.
    • See especially pages 387-395 for a discussion of Mandeville’s place in the luxury debate.
  • Hundert, E.J. The Enlightenment’s Fable: Bernard Mandeville and the Discovery of Society. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
    • A comprehensive book which examines the strategies of Mandeville’s ideas and sources and how they lent to his eighteenth-century influence.
  • Hundert, E.J. The Fable of the Bees: And Other Writings. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1997.
    • An anthology with a wonderful, short introduction to Mandeville.
  • Jones, M.G. The Charity School Movement: A Study of Eighteenth Century Puritanism in Action. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1938.
    • A valuable study, especially helpful in understanding the context of Mandeville’s “An Essay on Charity and Charity-Schools”.
  • Kaye, F.B. Commentary and Introduction to The Fable of the Bees, 2 Volumes. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1924.
    • The best modern edition and collection of The Fable along with an introduction to Mandeville’s work.
  • Kaye, F.B. “The Writings of Bernard Mandeville: A Bibliographical Survey” The Journal of English and Germanic Philology 20 (1921): 419-467.
    • A scholarly survey of Mandeville’s writings.
  • Kerkhof, B. “A fatal attraction? Smith’s ‘Theory of moral sentiments’ and Mandeville’s ‘Fable’” History of Political Thought 16 no. 2 (1995): 219-233
    • A helpful article on Mandeville’s distinction between “self-liking” and “self-love”
  • Malcom, J. “One State of Nature: Mandeville and Rousseau” Journal of the History of Ideas 39 no. 1 (1978): 119-124.
    • A piece exploring the similarities between Mandeville and Rousseau’s state of nature and process of human sociability.
  • Primer, I. (ed.), Mandeville Studies: New Explorations in the Art and Thought of Dr. Bernard Mandeville (1670-1733). The Hague: Nijhoff, 1975.
    • A collection of various articles, including pieces on some of Mandeville’s minor writings and his relation to specific writers, such as: Defoe, Shaftesbury and Voltaire.
  • Primer, I. The Fable of the Bees Or Private Vices, Publick Benefits. New York: Capricorn Books, 1962.
    • A helpful edited edition good for a basic overview of Mandeville’s thought- complete with an introduction.
  • Runciman, D. Political Hypocrisy: The Mask of Power, from Hobbes to Orwell and Beyond. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2008.
    • In chapter 2 the author proposes two types of hypocrisy present in Mandeville’s analysis and demonstrates how, to Mandeville, certain kinds of hypocrisy are necessary whilst others are detestable.
  • Welchman, J. “Who Rebutted Bernard Mandeville?” History of Philosophy Quarterly 24 No. 1 (2007): 57-74.
    • On Mandeville and some of his moral interlocutors. It presents several attempts to rebut Mandeville made by Hutcheson, Butler, Berkeley, Hume, and Smith.


Author Information

Phyllis Vandenberg
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.


Abigail DeHart
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.

Immanuel Kant: Philosophy of Religion

Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) focused on elements of the philosophy of religion for about half a century─from the mid-1750s, when he started teaching philosophy, until after his retirement from academia.  Having been reared in a distinctively religious environment, he remained concerned about the place of religious belief in human thought and action.  As he moved towards the development of his own original philosophical system in his pre-critical period through the years in which he was writing each Critique and subsequent works all the way to the incomplete, fragmentary Opus Postumum of his old age, his attention to religious faith was an enduring theme.  His discussions of God and religion represent a measure of the evolution of his philosophical worldview.  This began with his pre-critical advocacy of the rationalism in which he was educated.  Then this got subjected to the systematic critique that would open the doors to his own unique critical treatment.  Finally, at the end of his life, he seemed to experiment with a more radical approach.  As we follow the trajectory of this development, we see Kant moving from confidently advocating a demonstrative argument for the God of metaphysics to denying all theoretical knowledge of a theological sort, to affirming a moral argument establishing religious belief as rational, to suspicions regarding religion divorced from morality, and finally to hints of an idea of God so identified with moral duty as to be immanent rather than transcendent.  The key text representing the revolutionary move from his pre-critical, rationalistic Christian orthodoxy to his critical position (that could later lead to those suggestions of heterodox religious belief) is his seminal Critique of Pure Reason.  In the preface to its second edition, in one of the most famous sentences he ever wrote, he sets the theme for this radical transition by writing, “I have therefore found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith” (Critique, B).  Though never a skeptic (for example, he was always committed to scientific knowledge), Kant came to limit knowledge to objects of possible experience and to regard ideas of metaphysics (including theology) as matters of rational faith.

Table of Contents

  1. Kant and Religion
  2. God in Some Pre-critical Writings
  3. Each Critique as Pivotal
    1. The First Critique
    2. The Second Critique
    3. The Third Critique
  4. The Prolegomena and Kant’s Lectures
    1. The Prolegomena
    2. Kant’s Lectures
  5. Other Important Works
  6. His Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone
  7. Some Tantalizing Suggestions from the Opus Postumum
  8. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Kant and Religion

This article does not present a full biography of Kant. A more general account of his life can be found in the article Kant’s Aesthetics.  But five matters should be briefly addressed as background for discussing his philosophical theology:  (1) his association with Pietism; (2) his wish to strike a reasonable balance between (the Christian) religion and (Newtonian physical) science; (3) his attempt to steer a middle path between the excesses of dogmatic modern rationalism and skeptical modern empiricism; (4) his commitment to the Enlightenment ideals; and (5) his unpleasant encounter with the Prussian censor over his religious writings.

Kant was born, raised, educated, worked, lived, and died in Königsberg (now Kaliningrad, part of Russia), the capital city of East Prussia.  His parents followed the Pietist movement in German Lutheranism, as he was brought up to do.  Pietism stressed studying the scriptures as a basis for personal devotion, lay governance of the church, the conscientious practice of Christian ethics, religious education emphasizing the development and exercising of values, and preaching designed to inculcate and promote piety in its adherents.  At the age of eight, the boy was sent to a Pietist school directed by his family’s pastor.  Eight years later, he enrolled in the University of Königsberg, where he came under the influence of a Pietist professor of logic and metaphysics.  Even during later decades of his life, when he ceased to practice religion publicly (see letter to Lavater in Correspondence, pp. 152-154) and found external displays of pious devotion distasteful, his thought and values continued to be influenced by the Pietism of his earlier years.

Second, as a university student, Kant became a follower of Newtonian science.  The dissertation for his graduate degree was more what we would consider physics than philosophy, although in those days it was called “natural philosophy.”  Many of his earliest writings were in Newtonian science, including his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens of 1755 (in Cosmogony), dedicated to his king, Frederick the Great, and propounding a nebular hypothesis to explain the formation of our solar system.  He had reason to worry that his thoroughly mechanistic explanation might run afoul of Biblical fundamentalists who advocated the traditional doctrine of strict creationism.  This is illustrative of a tension with which he had to deal all of his adult life—regarding how to reconcile Christian faith and scientific knowledge—which his philosophy of religion would address.

Third, although this is a bit of an oversimplification, before Kant, modern European philosophy was generally split into two rival camps:  the Continental Rationalists, following Descartes, subscribed to a theory of a priori innate ideas that provide a basis for universal and necessary knowledge, while the British Empiricists, following Locke, subscribed to a tabula rasa theory, denying innate ideas and maintaining that our knowledge must ultimately be based on sense experience.  This split vitally affected views regarding knowledge of God.  Descartes and his followers were convinced that a priori knowledge of the existence of God, as an infinitely perfect Being, was possible and favored (what Kant would later call) the Ontological Argument as a way to establish it.  By contrast, Locke and his followers spurned such a priori reasoning and resorted to empirical approaches, such as the Cosmological Argument and the Teleological Arguments or Design Arguments.  An important Continental Rationalist was the German Leibniz, whose philosophy was systematized by Christian Wolff; in the eighteenth century, the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy was replacing scholasticism in German universities.  Kant’s family pastor and the professor who was so important in his education were both significantly influenced by Wolff’s philosophy, so that their young student was easily drawn into that orbit.  But he also came to study British Empiricists and was particularly disturbed by the challenges posed by the skeptical David Hume, which would gradually undermine his attachment to rationalism.  A vital feature of Kant’s mature philosophy is his attempt to work out a synthesis of these two great rival approaches.

Fourth, the eighteenth century was the heyday of the intellectual movement of the Enlightenment in Europe (as well as in North America), which was committed to ideals that Kant would appropriate as his own—including those of reason, experience, science, liberty, and progress.  Frederick II, who was the Prussian king for most of Kant’s adult life (from 1740 to 1786) was called both “Frederick the Great” and “the Enlightenment King.”  Hume and Wolff were both Enlightenment philosophers, as was Kant himself, who published a sort of manifesto for the movement, called “What Is Enlightenment?” (1784). There he calls his an age of developing enlightenment, though not yet a fully enlightened age.  He champions the cause of the free use of reason in public discussion, including freedom from censorship regarding publishing on religion (Essays, pp. 41-46).

Fifth, Kant himself faced a personal crisis when the Prussian government condemned his published book, Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone.  As long as Frederick the Great, “the Enlightenment King,” ruled, Kant and other Prussian scholars had broad latitude to publish controversial religious ideas in an intellectual atmosphere of general tolerance.  But Frederick was succeeded by his illiberal nephew, Frederick William II, who appointed a former preacher named Wöllner as his reactionary minister of spiritual affairs.  The anti-Enlightenment Wöllner issued edicts forbidding any deviations from orthodox Biblical doctrines and requiring approval by official state censors, prior to publication, for all works dealing with religion.  Kant managed to get the first book of his Religion cleared by one of Wöllner’s censors in Berlin.  But he was denied permission to publish Book II, which was seen as violating orthodox Biblical doctrines.  Having publicly espoused the right of scholars to publish even controversial ideas, Kant sought and got permission from the philosophical faculty at Jena (which also had that authority) to publish the second, third, and fourth books of his Religion and proceeded to do so.  When Wöllner found out about it, he was furious and sent Kant a letter, which he had written and signed, on behalf of the king, censuring Kant and threatening him with harsh consequences, should he ever repeat the offense.  Kant wrote a reply to the king, promising, “as your Majesty’s most loyal subject,” to refrain from all further public discussion of religion.  Until that king died (in 1797), Kant kept his promise.  But, as he later explained (Theology, pp. 239-243), that carefully worded qualifying phrase meant that the commitment would pass with that king, after whose death Kant, in fact, did resume publishing on religion.

2. God in Some Pre-critical Writings

Kant’s pre-critical writings are those that precede his Inaugural Dissertation of 1770, which marked his assumption of the chair in logic and metaphysics at the university.  These writings reflect a general commitment to the Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalist tradition.  Near the beginning of his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens of 1755, Kant observes that the harmonious order of the universe points to its divinely governing first Cause; near the end of it, he writes that even now the universe is permeated by the divine energy of an omnipotent Deity (Cosmogony, pp. 14 and 153).  In his New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge (of the same year), he points to God’s existence as the necessary condition of all possibility (Exposition, pp. 224-225).

In The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God of 1763, after warning his readers that any attempt at proving divine reality will plunge us into the “dark ocean without coasts and without lighthouses” that is metaphysics, he develops that line of argumentation towards God as the unconditioned condition of all possibility.  He denies the Cartesian thesis that existence is a predicate, thus undermining modern versions of the Ontological Argument.  The absolutely necessary Being that is the ground of all possibility must be one, simple, immutable, eternal, the highest reality, and a spirit, he argues.  He analyzes possible theoretical proofs of God into four possible sorts.  Two of these—the Ontological, which he rejects, and his own—are based on possibility; the other two—the Cosmological and the Teleological (Design), both of which he deems inconclusive—are empirical.  The final sentence of the book maintains that, though we must be convinced of God’s existence, logically demonstrating it is not required (Basis, pp. 43, 45, 57, 69, 71, 79, 81, 83, 87, 223, 225, 229, 231, and 239).  That same year, Kant also published his Enquiry concerning the Clarity of the Principles of Natural Theology and Ethics.  Here, while still expressing doubts that any metaphysical system of knowledge has yet been achieved, he nevertheless maintains his confidence that rational argumentation can lead to metaphysical knowledge, including that of God, as the absolutely necessary Being (Writings, pp. 14, 25, and 29-30).  What we see in these pre-critical writings is the stamp of Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalism, but also the developing influence of Hume, whom Kant was surely studying during this period.

3. Each Critique as Pivotal

The heart of Kant’s philosophical system is the triad of books constituting his great critiques:  his Critique of Pure Reason, published in 1781 (the A edition), with a significantly revised second edition appearing in 1787 (the B edition); his Critique of Practical Reason, published in 1788; and his Critique of Judgment, published in 1790.

a. The First Critique

Though some key ideas of the Critique of Pure Reason were adumbrated in Kant’s Inaugural Dissertation of 1770 (in Writings), this first Critique is revolutionary in the sense that, because of it, the history of philosophy became radically different from what it had been before its publication.  We cannot adequately explore all of the game-changing details of the epistemology (theory of knowledge) he develops there, which has been discussed elsewhere in the IEP (see “Immanuel Kant: Metaphysics”), but will only consider the elements that have a direct bearing on his philosophy of religion.

The monumental breakthrough of this book is Kant’s invention of the transcendental method in philosophy, which allows him to discover a middle path between modern rationalism, which attributes intellectual intuition (for example, innate ideas) to humans, enabling them to have universal and necessary factual knowledge, and modern empiricism, which maintains that we only have sensible intuition, making it difficult to see how we can ever achieve universal and necessary factual knowledge through reason.  Kant argues that both sides are partly correct and partly mistaken.  He agrees with the empiricists that all human factual knowledge begins with sensible intuition (which is the only sort we have), but avoids the skeptical conclusions to which this leads them by agreeing with the rationalists that we bring something a priori to the knowing process, while rejecting their dogmatic assumption that it must be the innate ideas of intellectual intuition.  According to Kant, universal and necessary factual knowledge requires both sensible experience, providing its content, and a priori structures of the mind, providing its form.  Either without the other is insufficient.  He famously writes, “Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (Critique, A51/B75).  Without empirical, sensible content, there is nothing for us to know; but without those a priori structures, we have no way of giving intelligible form to whatever content we may have.

The transcendental method seeks the necessary a priori conditions of experience, of knowledge, and of metaphysical speculation.  The two a priori forms of sensibility are time and space:  that is, for us to make sense of them, all objects of sensation, whether external or internal, must be temporally organizable and all objects of external sensation must also be spatially organizable.  But time and space are only forms of experience and not objects of experience, and they can only be known to apply to objects of sensible intuition.  When sensory inputs are received by us and spatio-temporally organized, the a priori necessary condition of our having objective knowledge is that one or more of twelve concepts of the understanding, also called “categories,” must be applied to our spatio-temporal representations.  These twelve categories include reality, unity, substance, causality, and existence.  Again, none of them is an object of experience; rather, they are all categories of the human mind, necessary for our knowing any objects of experience.  And, again, they can only be known to apply to objects of sensible intuition.  Now, by its very nature, metaphysics (including theology) necessarily speculates about ultimate reality that is not given to sensible intuition and therefore transcends any and all human perceptual experience.  It is a fact of human experience that we do engage in metaphysical speculation.  So what are the transcendental conditions of our capacity to do so?  Kant’s answer is that they are the three a priori ideas of pure reason—the self or soul, the cosmos or universe as an orderly whole, and God, the one of direct concern to us here.  But, as we never can have sensible experience of objects corresponding to such transcendent ideas and as the concepts of the understanding, without which human knowledge is impossible, can only be known to apply to objects of possible experience, knowledge of the soul, of the cosmos, and of God is impossible, in principle.

So what are we to make of ideas that can never yield knowledge?  Here Kant makes another innovative contribution to epistemology.  He says that ideas can have two possible functions in human thinking.  Some (for example, empirical) ideas have a “constitutive” function, in that they can be used to constitute knowledge, while others have only a “regulative” function (Critique, A180/B222), in that, while they can never constitute knowledge, they do serve the heuristic purpose of regulating our thought and action.  This is related to Kant’s dualistic distinction between the aspect of reality that comprises all phenomenal appearances and that which involves our noumenal ideas of things-in-themselves.  (Although it is important, we cannot here explore this distinction in the depth it deserves.)  Because metaphysical ideas are unknowable, they cannot serve any “constitutive” function.  Still, they have great “regulative” value for both our thinking and our voluntary choices.  They are relevant to our value-commitments, including those of a religious sort.  Three such regulative ideas are Kant’s postulates of practical reason, which are “God, freedom, and immortality” (Critique, A3/B7).  Although none of them refers to an object of empirical knowledge, he maintains that it is reasonable for us to postulate them as matters of rational faith.  This sort of belief, which is subjectively, but not objectively, justifiable, is a middle ground between certain knowledge, which is objectively, as well as subjectively, justified, and mere arbitrary opinion, which is not even subjectively justified (Critique, A822/B850).  Such rational belief can be religious—namely, faith in God.

Kant presents four logical puzzles that he calls “antinomies” to establish the natural  dialectical illusions that our reason inevitably encounters when it engages metaphysical questions about cosmology in an open-minded fashion.  The fourth of these particularly concerns us here, as reason purports to be able to prove both that there must be an absolutely necessary Being and that no such Being can exist.  His dualism can expose this apparent contradiction as bogus, maintaining that in the realm of phenomenal appearances, everything exists contingently, with no necessary Being, but that in the realm of noumenal things-in-themselves there can be such a necessary Being.

But, we might wonder, what about the traditional arguments for God?  If even one of them proves logically conclusive, would not that constitute some sort of knowledge of God?  Here we encounter yet another great passage in the first Critique, where Kant’s epistemology leads him to a trenchant undermining of all such arguments.  He maintains that there is a trichotomy of types of speculative arguments for God:  the “physico-theological” Argument from Design, various Cosmological Arguments, and the non-empirical "Ontological" Argument.  He cleverly shows that the first of these, even if it worked, would only establish a relatively intelligent and powerful architect of the world and not a necessarily existing Creator.  In order to establish it as a necessary Being, some version of the second approach is needed.  But, if that worked, it would still fail to show that the necessary creator is an infinitely perfect Being, worthy of religious devotion.  Only the Ontological Argument will suffice to establish that.  But here the problems accumulate.  The Ontological Argument fails because it tries to attribute infinite, necessary existence to God; but existence, far from being a real predicate of anything, is merely a concept of the human understanding.  Then the cosmological arguments also fail, in trying to establish that God is the necessary ultimate cause of the world, for both causality and necessity are merely categories of human understanding.  Although Kant exhibits considerable respect for the teleological argument from design, in addition to its conclusion being so disappointingly limited, it also fails as a logical demonstration, in trying to show that an intelligent Designer must exist to account for the alleged intelligent design of the world. The problem is that we do not and cannot ever experience the world as a coherent whole, so that the argument’s premise is merely assumed without foundation.  Thus Kant undermines the entire project of any philosophical theology that pretends to establish any knowledge of God (Critique, A592/B620-A614/B642 and A620/B648-A636/B664).  Yet he remains a champion of religious faith as rationally justifiable.  So how can he make such a position philosophically credible?

b. The Second Critique

Here we must turn to his ingenious Critique of Practical Reason.  Although it is essentially a work of ethics, a significant part of it is devoted to establishing belief in God (as well as in the immortality of the soul) as a rationally justifiable postulate of practical reason, by means of what has come to be called his “moral argument.”  The argument hinges on his claim that we have a moral duty to help bring about, not just the supreme good of moral virtue, which we can achieve by our own efforts in this life, but also “the highest good,” which is  the “perfect” correlation of “happiness in exact proportion to morality.”  Since there cannot be any moral obligation that it is impossible to meet (“ought” implies “can”), achieving this highest good must be possible.  However, there is no reason to believe that it can ever be achieved by us alone, acting either individually or collectively, in this life.  So it would seem that all our efforts in this life cannot suffice to achieve the highest good.  Yet there must be such a sufficient condition, supernatural and with attributes far exceeding ours, identifiable with God, with whom we can collaborate in the achievement of the highest good, not merely here and now but in the hereafter.  Thus he establishes God and human immortality as “morally necessary” hypotheses, matters of “rational faith.”  This is also the basis of Kant’s idea of moral religion, which we shall discuss in more detail below.  But, for now, we can observe his definition of “religion” as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands.”  Thus the moral argument is not purely speculative but has a practical orientation.  Kant does not pretend that the moral argument is constitutive of any knowledge.  If he did, it could be easily refuted by denying that we have any obligation to achieve the highest good, because it is, for us, an impossible ideal.  The moral argument rather deals with God as a regulative idea that can be shown to be a matter of rational belief.  The famous sentence near the end of the second Critique provides a convenient bridge between it and the third:  “Two things fill the mind with ever new and increasing admiration and awe, the oftener and more steadily we reflect on them:  the starry heavens above me and the moral law within me” (Reason, pp. 114-115/AA V: 110-111, 126-130/AA V: 121-126, 134/AA V: 129-130, and 166/AA V: 161).  As morality leads Kant to God and religion, so does the awesome teleological order of the universe.

c. The Third Critique

Although Kant’s Critique of Judgment is also not essentially a work in the philosophy of religion, its long appendix contains an important section that is germane for our purposes.  We recall that, while criticizing the teleological argument from design, Kant exhibited a high regard for it.  Such physical teleology points to a somewhat intelligent and powerful designing cause of the world.  But now Kant pursues moral teleology, which will connect such a deity to our own practical purposes—not only to our natural desire for happiness, but to our moral worthiness to achieve it, which is a function of our own virtuous good will.  He gives us another version of his moral argument for God, conceived not as the amoral, impersonal metaphysical principle indicated by the teleological argument from design, but rather as a personal deity who is the moral legislator and governor of the world.  Again, all this points to God as a regulative matter of “moral faith,” without any pretense of establishing any theological knowledge (which would violate Kant’s own epistemology).  Such faith is inescapably doubtful, in that it remains reasonable to maintain some doubt regarding it, and a matter of trust in teleological ends towards which we should be striving.  Nor should we be so presumptuous as to suppose that we can ever comprehend God’s nature or purposes.  It is only by analogy that we can contemplate such matters at all (Judgment, pp. 295-338/AA II: 442-485), a point which Kant more carefully develops in his Prolegomena.

4. The Prolegomena and Kant’s Lectures

a. The Prolegomena

Most—but not all—of the religious epistemology that is of note in Kant’s Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics is already contained in his more philosophically impressive first Critique and will not be repeated here.  But a few pages of its “Conclusion” add something that we have not yet considered.  One of the abiding problems of the philosophy of religion is how we can speak (and even think) about God except in anthropomorphic human terms without resorting to an indeterminate fog of ineffable mysticism.  The great rationalists are particularly challenged here, and Hume, whom Kant credits with awaking him from his dogmatic slumbers, mercilessly exploits their dilemma.  Kant’s project continues to be to navigate a perilous middle path between the equally problematic approaches of anthropomorphism  and mysticism.  Kant appreciates the dilemma as acutely as Hume, but wants to solve it rather than merely highlighting it.  Hume means to replace theism with an indeterminate deism.  Kant, himself a theist, admits that Hume’s objections against theism are devastating but holds that his arguments undermine only attempted deistic proofs and not deistic beliefs.  Remembering that the concepts of the understanding cannot be known to apply to anything that transcends all possible experience, we can see that it will be a challenge for Kant to evade Hume’s dilemma.  His approach is to distinguish between a malignant “dogmatic anthropomorphism,” which tries literally to attribute to God natural qualities, such as those attributable to humans, and a more benign “symbolic anthropomorphism,” which merely draws an analogy between God’s relation to our world and relations among things in our world, while avoiding thinking of them as identical.  Kant’s example is helpful here:  while we have no possible natural knowledge of God’s love for us and should acknowledge that it cannot be identical to any (necessarily limited) human love, we can use analogical language to think and talk about God’s love for us—as the love of human parents is directed to the welfare of their children, so God’s love for us is directed to human well-being.  Thus, Kant maintains, we can avoid the vicious sort of dogmatic anthropomorphism which Hume rightly attacks and, for example, attribute to God a rational relationship to our world without pretending that divine reason is exactly the same as ours, for example, discursive and, thus, limited  (Prolegomena, pp. 5, 19, and 96-99).  Thinking and speaking of God with analogous language can facilitate a theology that neither is anthropomorphic in a bad way nor succumbs to the dialectical illusions from which Kant’s epistemology would save us.

b. Kant’s Lectures

A somewhat neglected, but still important, dimension of Kant’s philosophy of religion can be found in his Lectures on Philosophical Theology, which comprises an introduction, a first part on transcendental theology, and a second part on moral theology.  After maintaining that rational theology’s essential value is practical rather than speculative, he defines religion as “the application of theology to morality,” which is a bit broader than the definition of the second Critique but is in line with it.  He conceives of the God of rational theology as the causal author and moral ruler of the world.  He considers himself a theist rather than a deist because he is committed to a free and moral “living God,” holy and just, as well as omniscient and omnipotent, as a postulate of practical reason (Lectures, pp. 24, 26, 30, and 41-42).  In the first part of the Lectures, Kant considers the speculative proofs of God, as well as the use of analogous language as a hedge against gross anthropomorphism.  But, as we have already discussed the more famous treatments of these topics (in the first Critique and the Prolegomena, respectively), we can pass over these here.

The second part of the Lectures starts with a version of the moral argument, which we have already considered (in connection with its more famous treatment in the second Critique).  This line of reasoning leads to the moral attributes of “God as a holy lawgiver, a benevolent sustainer of the world, and a just judge.”  A major problem of the philosophy of religion we have yet to consider is the problem of evil.  If, indeed, an infinitely perfect and supremely moral God governs the world with divine providence, how can there be so much evil, in all its multiple forms, in that world?  More specifically, for Kant, how can moral evil be consistent with divine holiness, pain and suffering with divine benevolence, and morally undeserved well-being and the lack of it with divine justice?  Despite God’s holiness, moral evil is a function of our  free will as rational creatures and our responsibility for our own development.  Despite God’s benevolence towards personal creatures, the physical evils of pain and suffering provide incentives for our progressing towards fulfillment.  And, despite God’s justice, the disproportion between virtue and well-being in this life must be temporary, to be rectified hereafter (Lectures, pp. 112 and 115-121).  This earlier (from the 1780s) attempt at theodicy on Kant’s part was neither particularly original nor particularly convincing.

5. Other Important Works

Kant deals with the problem of evil more impressively in his “On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy” (1791).  He analyzes possible attempts at theodicy into three approaches:  (a) it can argue that what we consider evil actually is not, so that there is really no conflict; (b) it can argue that the conflict between evil and God is naturally necessitated; and (c) it can argue that evil, though contingent, is the result of someone other than God.  Kant’s own earlier work attempted to combine the second and third strategies; but here he concludes that all of these approaches must fail.  More specifically, attempts to show that there is no pernicious conflict between moral evil and God’s holiness,   between the physical evils of pain and suffering and God’s goodness,  and, finally, between the disproportion of happiness and misery to virtue and vice and God’s justice, all fail using all three approaches.  Thus Kant’s considered conclusion is negative:  the doubts that are legitimately raised by the evil in our world can neither be conclusively answered nor conclusively refute God’s infinite moral wisdom.  Thus, theodicy, like matters of religion more generally, turns out to be a matter of faith and not one of knowledge (Theology, pp. 24-34; see also “What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” in Theology pp. 12-15, and “Speculative Beginning of Human History,” in Essays).  In a work published the year he died, Kant analyzes the core of his theological doctrine into three articles of faith:  (1) he believes in one God, who is the causal source of all good in the world; (2) he believes in the possibility of harmonizing God’s purposes with our greatest good; and (3) he believes in human immortality as the necessary condition of our continued approach to the highest good possible (Metaphysics, p. 131).  All of these doctrines of faith can be rationally supported.  This leaves open the issue of whether further religious beliefs, drawn from revelation, can be added to this core.  As Kant makes clear in The Conflict of the Faculties, he does not deny that divinely revealed truths are possible, but only that they are knowable.  So, we might wonder, of what practical use is revelation if it cannot be an object of knowledge?  His answer is that, even if it can never constitute knowledge, it can serve the regulative function of edification—contributing to our moral improvement and adding motivation to our moral purposes (Theology, pp. 283 and 287-288).

6. His Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone

Kant’s Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone of 1793 is considered by some to be the most underrated book in the entire history of the philosophy of religion.  In a letter to a theologian, he subsequently repeats the questions with which he thinks any philosophical system should deal (three of them in his first Critique, A 805/B 833; see also his Logic, pp. 28-30, where he adds a fourth).  The first one, regarding human knowledge, had been covered in the first Critique and the Prolegomena; the second, regarding practical values, was considered in his various writings on ethics and socio-political philosophy; the fourth, regarding human nature, had been covered in his philosophical anthropology. Now,  with Religion, Kant addresses the third question of what we can reasonably hope for, and moves towards completing his system (Correspondence, pp. 458-459).  Thus we can conclude that Kant himself sees this book, the publication of which got him into trouble with the Prussian government, as crucial to his philosophical purposes.  Hence we should take it seriously here as representative of his own rational theology.  In his Preface to the first edition, he again points out that reflection on moral obligation should lead us to religion (Religion, pp. 3-6; see also Education, pp. 111-114, for his analysis of how religion should be taught to children).  In his Preface to the second edition, he offers an illuminating metaphor of two concentric circles—the inner one representing the core of the one religion of pure moral reason and the outer one representing many revealed historical religions, all of which should include and build on that core (Religion, p. 11).

In the first book, Kant considers our innate natural predisposition to good (in being animals, humans, and persons) and our equally innate propensity to evil (in our frailty, impurity, and wickedness).  Whether we end up being praiseworthy or blameworthy depends, not on our sensuous nature or our theoretical reason, but on the use we make of our free will, which is naturally oriented towards both good and evil.  There are two dimensions of what we call “will,” both of which are important in grasping Kant’s view here.  On the one hand, there is our capacity for free choice (his word is “Willkür”); on the other hand, there is practical reason as rationally legislating moral choice and action (“Wille”).  Thus a “good will” chooses in accordance with the rational demands of the moral law.  At any rate, we are born with a propensity to evil; but whether we become evil depends on our own free acts of will.  Thus Kant demythologizes the Christian doctrine of original sin.  He then distinguishes between the phony religion of mere worship designed to win favor for ourselves and the authentic moral religion of virtuous behavior.  Although it is legitimate to hope for God’s grace as helping us to lead morally good lives, it is mere fanaticism to imagine that we can become good by soliciting grace rather than freely choosing virtuous conduct (Religion, pp. 21-26, 30, 32, 35, and 47-49).

In the second book, Jesus of Nazareth is presented as an archetype symbolizing our ability to resist our propensity to evil and to approach the virtuous ideal of moral perfection.  What Kant does not say is whether or not, in addition to being a moral model whose example we should try to follow, Jesus is also of divine origin in some unique manner attested to by miracles.  Just as he neither denies nor affirms the divinity of Christ, so Kant avoids committing himself regarding belief in miracles, which can lead us into superstition (Religion, pp. 51, 54, 57, 74, 77, and 79-82; for more on the mystery of the Incarnation, see Theology, pp. 264-265).

In the third book, Kant expresses his rational hope for the ultimate supremacy of good over evil and the establishment of an ethical commonwealth of persons under a personal God, who is the divine law-giver and moral ruler—the ideal of the invisible church, as opposed to actual realities of visible churches.  Whereas statutory religion focuses on obedient external behavior, true religion concerns internal commitment (or good will).  Mere worship is a worthless substitute for good choices and virtuous conduct.  Here Kant makes a particularly provocative claim, that, ultimately, there is only “one (true) religion,” the religion of morality, while there can be various historical “faiths” promoting it.  From this perspective, Judaism, Islam, and the various denominations of Christianity are all legitimate faiths, to be located in Kant’s metaphorical outer circle, including the true religion of morality, his metaphorical inner circle.  However, some faiths can be relatively more adequate expressions of the religion of moral reason than others (Religion, pp. 86, 89-92, 95, and 97-98; see also Theology, pp. 262-265).

In his particularly inflammatory fourth book, Kant probes the distinction between legitimate religious service and the pseudo-service of religious clericalism.  From our human perspective, religion—both revealed and natural—should be regarded as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands.”  Kant embraces the position of “pure rationalist,” rather than naturalism (which denies divine revelation) or pure supernaturalism (which considers it necessary), in that he accepts the possibility of revelation but does not dogmatically regard it as necessary.  He acknowledges scripture scholars’ valuable role in helping to disseminate religious truth so long as they respect “universal human reason as the supremely commanding principle.”  Christianity is both a natural and a revealed religion, and Kant shows how the gospel of Matthew expresses Kantian ethics, with Jesus as its wise moral teacher.  Following his moral teachings is the means to true religious service, whereas substituting an attachment to external worship allegedly required instead of moral behavior is mere “pseudo-service.” Superstition and fanaticism are typical aspects of such illusions and substituting superstitious rituals for morally virtuous conduct  is mere “fetishism.”  Kant denounces clericalism as promoting such misguided pseudo-service.  The ideal of genuine godliness comprises a combination of fear of God and love of God, which should converge to help render us persons of morally good will.  So what about such religious practices as prayer, church attendance, and participation in sacraments?  They can be either good expressions of devotion, if they bind us together in moral community (occupying Kant’s inner circle) or bad expressions of mere pseudo-service, if designed to ingratiate us with God (an accretion to the outer circle not rooted in the inner circle of genuine moral commitment).  Mere external shows of piety must never be substituted for authentic inner virtue (Religion, pp. 142-143, 147-153, 156-158, 162, 165, 167-168, 170, and 181-189; cf. Ethics, pp. 78-116).  Kant’s Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone provides a capstone for the revolutionary treatment of religion associated with his critical philosophy.

7. Some Tantalizing Suggestions from the Opus Postumum

Yet it is quite admirable that, in the last few years of his life, despite struggling with the onset of dementia that made any such task increasingly challenging, he kept trying to explore new dimensions of the philosophy of religion.  As has already been admitted, the results, located in his fragmentary Opus Postumum, are more provocative than satisfying; yet they are nevertheless worthy of brief consideration here.  The work comprises a vast quantity of scattered remarks, many of which are familiar to readers of his earlier writings, but some of which represent acute, fresh insights, albeit none of them adequately developed.  Here again Kant  writes that reflection on moral duty, determinable by means of the categorical imperative, can reasonably lead us to the idea of God, as a rational moral agent with unlimited power over the realms of nature and of freedom, who prescribes our duties as divine commands.   He then adds a bold idea, which breaks with his own previous orthodox theological concept of a transcendent God.  Developing his old notion of God as “an ideal of human reason,” he identifies God with our concept of moral duty rather than as an independent substance.  This notion of an immanent God (that is, one internal to our world rather than transcendently separate from it), while not carefully worked out by Kant himself, would be developed by later German Idealists (most significantly, Hegel).  While conceding that we think of God as an omnipotent, omniscient, and omnibenevolent personal Being, Kant now denies that personality can be legitimately attributed to God—again stepping out of mainstream Judeo-Christian doctrine.  Also, rather than still postulating God as an independent reality, he here says that “God and the world are correlates,” interdependent and mutually implicating one another.  Unfortunately, we can only conjecture as to what, exactly, he means by this claim.  Referring to Spinoza (the most important pre-Kantian panentheist in modern philosophy), he pushes the point even more radically, writing, “I am in the highest being.”  But, then,   Kant goes on to condemn Spinoza’s panentheistic conception of God (that is, the view also found in  Hegel, that God contains our world rather than transcending it) as outlandish “enthusiastic” fanaticism. In fact, he suggests the inverse—instead of holding that we are in God, Kant now indicates that God is in us, though different from us,  in that God's reality is ideal rather than substantial.  He proceeds to maintain that not only God is infinite, but so are the world and rational freedom, identifying God with “the inner vital spirit of man in the world.”  Kant makes one final controversial claim  when he denies that a concept of God is even essential to religion (Opus, pp. 200-204, 210-211, 213-214, 225, 229, 231, 234-236, 239-240, and 248).  This denial is clearly not an aspect of Kant’s thought that is familiar and famous, and we should beware of presuming that we understand precisely what should be made of it.  But what is undeniable is what a long and soaring intellectual journey Kant made as he developed his ideas on God and religion from his pre-critical writings through the central, revolutionary works of his philosophical maturity and into the puzzling but tantalizing thought-experiments of his old age.

8. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Immanuel Kant, “An Answer to the Question:  What is Enlightenment?” trans. Ted Humphrey, in Essays.
  • Immanuel Kant, The Conflict of the Faculties, trans. Mary J. Gregor and Robert Anchor, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, Correspondence, trans. and edited by Arnulf Zweig.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Judgment, trans. J. H. Bernard (called “Judgment”).  New York: Hafner, 1968. References to this translation are accompanied by references to the Akademie Ausgabe Volume II.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Practical Reason, trans. Lewis White Beck (called “Reason”).  Indianapolis:  Bobbs-Merrill, 1956. References to this translation are accompanied by references to the Akademie Ausgabe Volume V.
  • Immanuel Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, trans. Norman Kemp Smith (called Critique).  New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1965. References are to the A and B German editions.
  • Immanuel Kant, Education, trans. Annette Churton.  Ann Arbor:  University of Michigan Press, 1960.
  • Immanuel Kant, “The End of All Things,” trans. Allen W. Wood, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, Enquiry concerning the Clarity of the Principles of Natural Theology and Ethics, trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford, in Writings.
  • Immanuel Kant, Kant’s Cosmogony, trans. W. Hastie (called “Cosmogony”).  New York:  Garland, 1968.
  • Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Ethics, trans. Louis Infield (called “Ethics”).  New York:  Harper & Row, 1963.
  • Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Philosophical Theology, trans. Allen W. Wood and Gertrude M. Clark (called “Lectures”).  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1978.
  • Immanuel Kant, Logic, trans. Robert Hartman and Wolfgang Schwarz.  Indianapolis:  Bobbs-Merrill, 1974.
  • Immanuel Kant, New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge, trans. F. E. England (called “Exposition”), in England (below).
  • Immanuel Kant, On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and Intelligible World (Inaugural Dissertation), trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford, in Writings.
  • Immanuel Kant, “On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy,” trans. George di Giovanni, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God, trans. Gordon Treash (called “Basis”).  Lincoln:  University of Nebraska Press, 1994.
  • Immanuel Kant, Opus Postumum, edited by Eckart Förster and trans. Eckart Förster and Michael Rosen (called “Opus”).  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Immanuel Kant, Perpetual Peace and Other Essays, trans. Ted Humphrey (called “Essays”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1983.
  • Immanuel Kant, Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, trans. Paul Carus and revised by James W. Ellington (called “Prolegomena”).  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1977.
  • Immanuel Kant, Religion and Rational Theology, trans. and edited by Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (called “Theology”).  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Immanuel Kant, Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone, trans. Theodore M. Greene and Hoyt H. Hudson (called “Religion”).  New York:  Harper & Row, 1960.
  • Immanuel Kant, Selected Pre-Critical Writings and Correspondence with Beck, trans. G. B. Kerford and D. E. Walford (called “Writings”).  Manchester:  Manchester University Press, 1968.
  • Immanuel Kant, “Speculative Beginning of Human History,” trans. Ted Humphrey, in Essays.
  • Immanuel Kant, Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens, trans. W. Hastie, in Cosmogony.
  • Immanuel Kant, “What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?”, trans. Allen W. Wood, in Theology.
  • Immanuel Kant, What Real Progress Has Metaphysics Made in Germany since the Time of Leibniz and Wolff?, trans. Ted Humphrey (called “Metaphysics”).  New York:  Abaris Books, 1983.

b. Secondary Sources

  • James Collins, The Emergence of Philosophy of Religion.  New Haven:  Yale University Press, 1967.
    • Chapters 3 through 5 deal with Kant’s philosophy of religion in a meticulous manner.
  • Frederick Copleston, S. J., A History of Philosophy, Volume 6.  Garden City:  Image Books, 1964.
    • Though old, this volume still represents exemplary Kant scholarship.
  • A. Hazard Dakin, “Kant and Religion," in The Heritage of Kant, edited by George Tapley Whitney and David F. Bowers.   New York:  Russell & Russell, 1962.
    • This is a non-technical critical analysis of Kant’s views on religion.
  • Michel Despland, Kant on History and Religion.  Montreal:  McGill-Queen’s University Press, 1973.
    • The second part of this book offers a detailed coverage of Kant’s philosophy of religion.
  • George di Giovanni, “Translator’s Introduction” to Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, in Theology, pp. 41-54.
    • This is an informative account of the history of Kant’s Religion.
  • S. Morris Engel, “Kant’s ‘Refutation’ of the Ontological Argument,” in Kant:  A Collection of Critical Essays, edited by Robert Paul Wolff.  Garden City:  Anchor Books, 1967.
    • This remains a provocative critical analysis of Kant’s critique of this argument.
  • F. E. England, Kant’s Conception of God.  New York:  Humanities Press, 1968.
    • This is a very good study of Kant’s development of a philosophy of religion.
  • Chris L. Firestone and Nathan Jacobs, In Defense of Kant’s Religion.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 2008.
    • This book cleverly presents criticisms of Kant’s views answered by defenses.
  • Chris L. Firestone and Stephen R. Palmquist, editors, Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 2006.
    • This is a good anthology of recent essays from both philosophical and theological perspectives.
  • Chris L. Firestone, “Making Sense Out of Tradition:  Theology and Conflict in Kant’s Philosophy of Religion,” in Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion, pp. 141-156.
    • This article does a good job of explaining Kant’s views on the proper roles of philosophers and theologians in dealing with religion.
  • Eckart Förster, Kant’s Final Synthesis:  An Essay on the Opus Postumum.  Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 2000.
    • This is a close study of Kant’s final work.
  • Theodore M. Greene, “The Historical Context and Religious Significance of Kant’s Religion,” translator’s introduction to Religion.
    • This offers a long and still valuable perspective on Kant’s major work in the philosophy of religion.
  • Manfred Kuehn, Kant:  A Biography.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2001.
    • This is arguably the best intellectual biography of Kant in English.
  • G. E. Michalson, Jr., The Historical Dimensions of a Rational Faith:  The Role of History in Kant’s Religious Thought.  Washington, DC:  University Press of America, 1979.
    • This book relates Kant’s views on religion to his conception of history.
  • Stephen R. Palmquist, “Introduction” to Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason, trans. Werner S. Pluhar.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 2009.
    • This is a long and careful introduction to yet another translation of Kant’s most important book in the philosophy of religion.
  • Stephen R. Palmquist, Kant’s Critical Religion.  Aldershot, UK:  Ashgate, 2000.
    • This book explores its subject in astonishing detail.
  • Wayne P. Pomerleau, Western Philosophies of Religion.  New York:  Ardsley House, 1998.
    • The sixth chapter of this book is a detailed study of Kant’s philosophy of religion.
  • Bernard M. G. Reardon, Kant as Philosophical Theologian.  Totowa, NJ:  Barnes & Noble Books, 1988.
    • This fairly short book nevertheless develops a penetrating analysis of the subject.
  • Philip J. Rossi and Michael Wreen, editors, Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered.  Bloomington:  Indiana University Press, 1991.
    • This anthology contains some valuable essays on Kant’s theory.
  • Clement C. J. Webb, Kant’s Philosophy of Religion.  Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 1926.
    • This classic general treatment of this topic is still valuable.
  • Allen W. Wood, “General Introduction” to Theology, pp. xi-xxiv.
    • This is brief but, like all of Wood’s work on this subject, well done.
  • Allen W. Wood, “Kant’s Deism,” in Kant’s Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered, pp. 1-21.
    • This is a provocative article considering the pros and cons of regarding Kant as a deist.
  • Allen W. Wood, Kant’s Moral Religion.  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1970.
    • This is an excellent treatment of Kant’s view of morality as the core of true religion.
  • Allen W. Wood, Kant’s Rational Theology.  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1978.
    • This book is more focused on Kant’s critique of speculative theology.
  • Allen W. Wood, “Rational Theology, Moral Faith, and Religion,” in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, edited by Paul Guyer.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • This essay offers an illuminating connection of important strands of Kant’s philosophy of religion.


Author Information

Wayne P. Pomerleau
Gonzaga University
U. S. A.

David Hume (1711—1776)

“Hume is our Politics, Hume is our Trade, Hume is our Philosophy, Hume is our Religion.” This statement by nineteenth century philosopher James Hutchison Stirling reflects the unique position in intellectual thought held by Scottish philosopher David Hume. Part of Hume’s fame and importance owes to his boldly skeptical approach to a range of philosophical subjects. In epistemology, he questioned common notions of personal identity, and argued that there is no permanent “self” that continues over time. He dismissed standard accounts of causality and argued that our conceptions of cause-effect relations are grounded in habits of thinking, rather than in the perception of causal forces in the external world itself. He defended the skeptical position that human reason is inherently contradictory, and it is only through naturally-instilled beliefs that we can navigate our way through common life. In the philosophy of religion, he argued that it is unreasonable to believe testimonies of alleged miraculous events, and he hints, accordingly, that we should reject religions that are founded on miracle testimonies. Against the common belief of the time that God’s existence could be proven through a design or causal argument, Hume offered compelling criticisms of standard theistic proofs. He also advanced theories on the origin of popular religious beliefs, grounding such notions in human psychology rather than in rational argument or divine revelation. The larger aim of his critique was to disentangle philosophy from religion and thus allow philosophy to pursue its own ends without rational over-extension or psychological corruption.  In moral theory, against the common view that God plays an important role in the creation and reinforcement of moral values, he offered one of the first purely secular moral theories, which grounded morality in the pleasing and useful consequences that result from our actions. He introduced the term “utility” into our moral vocabulary, and his theory is the immediate forerunner to the classic utilitarian views of Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. He is famous for the position that we cannot derive ought from is, the view that statements of moral obligation cannot simply be deduced from statements of fact. Some see Hume as an early proponent of the emotivist metaethical view that moral judgments principally express our feelings. He also made important contributions to aesthetic theory with his view that there is a uniform standard of taste within human nature, in political theory with his critique of social contractarianism, and economic theory with his anti-mercantilist views. As a philosophical historian, he defended the conservative view that British governments are best run through a strong monarchy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Origin and Association of Ideas
  3. Epistemological Issues
    1. Space
    2. Time
    3. Necessary Connection between Causes and Effects
    4. External Objects
    5. Personal Identity
    6. Free Will
  4. Skepticism
  5. Theory of the Passions
  6. Religious Belief
    1. Miracles
    2. Psychology of Religious Belief
    3. Arguments for God’s Existence
  7. Moral Theory
  8. Aesthetic, Political, and Economic Theory
  9. History and Philosophy
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Recent Editions of Hume’s Writings
    2. Chronological List of Hume’s Publications
    3. Biographies, Letters, Manuscripts
    4. Bibliographies
    5. Works on Hume

1. Life


David Hume was born in 1711 to a moderately wealthy family from Berwickshire Scotland, near Edinburgh. His background was politically Whiggish and religiously Calvinistic. As a child he faithfully attended the local Church of Scotland, pastored by his uncle. Hume was educated by his widowed mother until he left for the University of Edinburgh at the age of eleven. His letters describe how as a young student he took religion seriously and obediently followed a list of moral guidelines taken from The Whole Duty of Man, a popular Calvinistic devotional.

Leaving the University of Edinburgh around the age of fifteen to pursue his education privately, he was encouraged to consider a career in law, but his interests soon turned to philosophy. During these years of private study he began raising serious questions about religion, as he recounts in the following letter:

Tis not long ago that I burn’d an old Manuscript Book, wrote before I was twenty; which contain’d, Page after Page, the gradual Progress of my Thoughts on that head [i.e. religious belief]. It begun with an anxious Search after Arguments, to confirm the common Opinion: Doubts stole in, dissipated, return’d, were again dissipated, return’d again [To Gilbert Elliot of Minto, March 10, 1751].

Although his manuscript book was destroyed, several pages of his study notes survive from his early twenties. These show a preoccupation with proofs for God’s existence as well as atheism, particularly as he read on these topics in classical Greek and Latin texts and in Pierre Bayle’s skeptical Historical and Critical Dictionary. During these years of private study, some of which were in France, he composed his three-volume Treatise of Human Nature, which was published anonymously in two installments before he was thirty (1739, 1740). The Treatise explores several philosophical topics such as space, time, causality, external objects, the passions, free will, and morality, offering original and often skeptical appraisals of these notions. Book I of the Treatise was unfavorably reviewed in the History of the Works of the Learned with a succession of sarcastic comments. Although scholars today recognized it as a philosophical masterpiece, Hume was disappointed with the minimal interest his book spawned and said that “It fell dead-born from the press, without reaching such distinctions even to excite a murmur among the zealots” (My Own Life).

In 1741 and 1742 Hume published his two-volume Essays, Moral and Political, which were written in a popular style and were more successful than the Treatise. In 1744-1745 he was a candidate for the Chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Edinburgh. The Edinburgh Town Council was responsible for electing a replacement, and critics opposed Hume by condemning his anti-religious writings. Chief among the critics was clergyman William Wishart (d. 1752), the Principal of the University of Edinburgh. Lists of allegedly dangerous propositions from Hume’s Treatise circulated, presumably penned by Wishart himself. In the face of such strong opposition, the Edinburgh Town Council consulted the Edinburgh ministers. Hoping to win over the clergy, Hume composed a point by point reply to the circulating lists of dangerous propositions, which was published as A Letter from a Gentleman to his Friend in Edinburgh. The clergy were not swayed, 12 of the 15 ministers voted against Hume, and he quickly withdrew his candidacy. In 1745 Hume accepted an invitation from General St Clair to attend him as secretary. He wore the uniform of an officer, and accompanied the general on an expedition against Canada (which ended in an incursion on the coast of France) and to an embassy post in the courts of Vienna and Turin.

Because of the success of his Essays, Hume was convinced that the poor reception of his Treatise was caused by its style rather than by its content. In 1748 he published his Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, a more popular rendition of portions of Book I of the Treatise. The Enquiry also includes two sections not found in the Treatise: “Of Miracles” and a dialogue titled “Of a Particular Providence and of a Future State.” Each section contains direct attacks on religious belief. In 1751 he published his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, which recasts parts of Book III of the Treatise in a very different form. The work establishes a system of morality upon utility and human sentiments alone, and without appeal to divine moral commands. By the end of the century Hume was recognized as the founder of the moral theory of utility, and utilitarian political theorist Jeremy Bentham acknowledged Hume’s direct influence upon him. The same year Hume also published his Political Discourses, which drew immediate praise and influenced economic thinkers such as Adam Smith, William Godwin, and Thomas Malthus.

In 1751-1752 Hume sought a philosophy chair at the University of Glasgow, and was again unsuccessful. In 1752 his new employment as librarian of the Advocate’s Library in Edinburgh provided him with the resources to pursue his interest in history. There, he wrote much of his highly successful six-volume History of England (published from 1754 to 1762). The first volume was unfavorably received, partially for its defense of Charles I, and partially for two sections which attack Christianity. In one passage Hume notes that the first Protestant reformers were fanatical or “inflamed with the highest enthusiasm” in their opposition to Roman Catholic domination. In the second passage he labels Roman Catholicism a superstition which “like all other species of superstition. . .  rouses the vain fears of unhappy mortals.” The most vocal attack against Hume’s History came from Daniel MacQueen in his 300 page Letters on Mr. Hume’s History. MacQueen scrutinizes the first volume of Hume’s work, exposing all the allegedly “loose and irreligious sneers” Hume makes against Christianity. Ultimately, this negative response led Hume to delete the two controversial passages from succeeding editions of the History.

Around this time Hume also wrote his two most substantial works on religion: The Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and The Natural History of Religion. The Natural History appeared in 1757, but, on the advice of friends who wished to steer Hume away from religious controversy, the Dialogues remained unpublished until 1779, three years after his death. The Natural History aroused controversy even before it was made public. In 1756 a volume of Hume’s essays titled Five Dissertations was printed and ready for distribution. The essays included (1) “The Natural History of Religion;” (2) “Of the Passions;” (3) “Of Tragedy;” (4) “Of Suicide;” and (5) “Of the Immortality of the Soul.” The latter two essays made direct attacks on common religious doctrines by defending a person’s moral right to commit suicide and by criticizing the idea of life after death. Early copies were passed around, and Hume’s publisher was threatened with prosecution if the book was distributed as it was. The printed copies of Five Dissertations were then physically altered by removing the essays on suicide and immortality, and inserting a new essay “Of the Standard of Taste” in their place. Hume also took this opportunity to alter two particularly offending paragraphs in the Natural History. The essays were then bound with the new title Four Dissertations and distributed in January, 1757.

In the years following Four Dissertations, Hume completed his last major literary work, The History of England, which gave him a reputation as an historian that equaled, if not overshadowed, his reputation as a philosopher.  In 1763, at age 50, he was invited to accompany the Earl of Hertford to the embassy in Paris, with a near prospect of being his secretary. He eventually accepted, and remarks at the reception he received in Paris “from men and women of all ranks and stations.” He returned to Edinburgh in 1766, and continued developing relations with the greatest minds of the time. Among these was Jean Jacques Rousseau who in 1766 was ordered out of Switzerland by the government in Berne. Hume offered Rousseau refuge in England and secured him a government pension. In England, Rousseau became suspicious of plots, and publicly charged Hume with conspiring to ruin his character, under the appearance of helping him. Hume published a pamphlet defending his actions and was exonerated. Another secretary appointment took him away from 1767-1768. Returning again to Edinburgh, his remaining years were spent revising and refining his published works, and socializing with friends in Edinburgh’s intellectual circles. In 1770, fellow Scotsman James Beattie published one of the harshest attacks on Hume’s philosophy to ever appear in print, entitled An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth in Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism. Hume was upset by Beattie’s relentless verbal attacks against him in the work, but the book made Beattie famous and King George III, who admired it, awarded Beattie a pension of £200 per year.

In 1776, at age sixty-five, Hume died from an internal disorder which had plagued him for many months. After his death, his name took on new significance as several of his previously unpublished works appeared. The first was a brief autobiography, My Own Life, but even this unpretentious work aroused controversy. As his friends, Adam Smith and S.J. Pratt, published affectionate eulogies describing how he died with no concern for an afterlife, religious critics responded by condemning this unjustifiable admiration of Hume’s infidelity. Two years later, in 1779, Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion appeared. Again, the response was mixed. Admirers of Hume considered it a masterfully written work, while religious critics branded it as dangerous to religion. Finally, in 1782, Hume’s two suppressed essays on suicide and immortality were published. Their reception was almost unanimously negative.

2. Origin and Association of Ideas

Drawing heavily on John Locke’s empiricism, the opening sections of both the Treatise and Enquiry discuss the origins of mental perceptions as laid out in the following categorical scheme:


A. Ideas

1. From memory

2. From imagination

a. From fancy

b. From understanding

(1) Involving relations of ideas

(2) Involving matters of fact

B. Impressions

1. Of sensation (external)

2. Of reflection (internal)

Hume begins by dividing all mental perceptions between ideas (thoughts) and impressions (sensations and feelings), and then makes two central claims about the relation between them. First, advancing what is commonly called Hume’s copy thesis, he argues that all ideas are ultimately copied from impressions. That is, for any idea we select, we can trace the component parts of that idea to some external sensation or internal feeling. This claim places Hume squarely in the empiricist tradition, and he regularly uses this principle as a test for determining the content of an idea under consideration. As proof of the copy thesis, Hume challenges anyone who denies it “to shew a simple impression, that has not a correspondent idea, or a simple idea, that has not a correspondent impression” (Treatise, 1.1.1). Second, advancing what we may call Hume’s liveliness thesis, he argues that ideas and impressions differ only in terms of liveliness. For example, my impression of a tree is simply more vivid than my idea of that tree. One of his early critics, Lord Monboddo (1714–1799) pointed out an important implication of the liveliness thesis, which Hume himself presumably hides. Most modern philosophers held that ideas reside in our spiritual minds, whereas impressions originate in our physical bodies. So, when Hume blurs the distinction between ideas and impressions, he is ultimately denying the spiritual nature of ideas and instead grounding them in our physical nature. In short, all of our mental operations—including our most rational ideas—are physical in nature. As Monboddo writes, “One consequence, which Mr Hume has drawn from this doctrine, is, that, as our Mind can only operate by the organs of the Body, it must perish with the Body” (Ancient Metaphysics, 1782, 2.2.2).

Hume goes on to explain that there are several mental faculties that are responsible for producing our various ideas. He initially divides ideas between those produced by the memory, and those produced by the imagination. The memory is a faculty that conjures up ideas based on experiences as they happened. For example, the memory I have of my drive to the store is a comparatively accurate copy of my previous sense impressions of that experience. The imagination, by contrast, is a faculty that breaks apart and combines ideas, thus forming new ones. Hume uses the familiar example of a golden mountain: this idea is a combination of an idea of gold and an idea of a mountain. As our imagination takes our most basic ideas and leads us to form new ones, it is directed by three principles of association, namely, resemblance, contiguity, and cause and effect. By virtue of resemblance, an illustration or sketch, of a person leads me to an idea of that actual person. The idea of one apartment in a building leads me to think of the apartment contiguous to—or next to—the first. The thought of a scar on my hand leads me to think of a broken piece of glass that caused the scar.

As indicated in the above chart, our more complex ideas of the imagination are further divided between two categories. Some imaginative ideas represent flights of the fancy, such as the idea of a golden mountain; however, other imaginative ideas represent solid reasoning, such as predicting the trajectory of a thrown ball. The fanciful ideas are derived from the faculty of the fancy, and are the source of fantasies, superstitions, and bad philosophy. By contrast, sound ideas are derived from the faculty of the understanding—or reason—and are of two types: (1) involving relations of ideas; or (2) involving matters of fact. A relation of ideas (or relation between ideas) is a mathematical relation that is “discoverable by the mere operation of thought, without dependence on what is anywhere existent in the universe,” such as the mathematical statement “the square of the hypotenuse is equal to the square of the two sides” (Enquiry, 4). By contrast, a matter of fact, for Hume, is any object or circumstance which has physical existence, such as “the sun will rise tomorrow”. This split between relations of ideas and matters of fact is commonly called “Hume’s Fork”, and Hume himself uses it as a radical tool for distinguishing between well-founded ideas of the understanding, and unfounded ideas of the fancy. He dramatically makes this point at the conclusion of his Enquiry:

When we run over libraries, persuaded of these principles, what havoc must we make? If we take in our hand any volume; of divinity or school metaphysics, for instance; let us ask, Does it contain any abstract reasoning concerning quantity or number? No. Does it contain any experimental reasoning concerning matter of fact and existence? No. Commit it then to the flames: For it can contain nothing but sophistry and illusion (Enquiry, 12).

For Hume, when we imaginatively exercise our understanding regarding relations of ideas and matters of fact, our minds are guided by seven philosophical or “reasoning” relations, which are as follows:

Principles of reasoning concerning relations of ideas (involving demonstration): (1) resemblance; (2) contrariety; (3) degrees in quality; and (4) proportions in quantity or number

Principles of reasoning concerning matters of fact (involving judgments of probability): (5) identity; (6) relations in time and place; and (7) causation

Human understanding and reasoning at its best, then, involves ideas that are grounded in the above seven principles.

3. Epistemological Issues


Much of Hume’s epistemology is driven by a consideration of philosophically important issues, such as space and time, cause-effect, external objects, personal identity, and free will. In his analysis of these issues in the Treatise, he repeatedly does three things. First, he skeptically argues that we are unable to gain complete knowledge of some important philosophical notion under consideration. Second, he shows how the understanding gives us a very limited idea of that notion. Third, he explains how some erroneous views of that notion are grounded in the fancy, and he accordingly recommends that we reject those erroneous ideas. We will follow this three-part scheme as we consider Hume’s discussions of various topics.

a. Space

On the topic of space, Hume argues that our proper notions of space are confined to our visual and tactile experiences of the three-dimensional world, and we err if we think of space more abstractly and independently of those visual and tactile experiences. In essence, our proper notion of space is like what Locke calls a “secondary quality” of an object, which is spectator dependent, meaning grounded in the physiology of our perceptual mental processes. Thus, our proper notion of space is not like a “primary quality” that refers to some external state of affairs independent of our perceptual mental process. Following the above three-part scheme, (1) Hume skeptically argues that we have no ideas of infinitely divisible space (Treatise, (2) When accounting for the idea we do have of space, he argues that “the idea of space is convey’d to the mind by two senses, the sight and touch; nor does any thing ever appear extended, that is not either visible or tangible” (Treatise, Further, he argues that these objects—which are either visible or tangible—are composed of finite atoms or corpuscles, which are themselves “endow’d with colour and solidity.” These impressions are then “comprehended” or conceived by the imagination; it is from the structuring of these impressions that we obtain a limited idea of space. (3) In contrast to this idea of space, Hume argues that we frequently presume to have an idea of space that lacks visibility or solidity. He accounts for this erroneous notion in terms of a mistaken association that people naturally make between visual and tactile space (Treatise,

b. Time

Hume’s treatment of our idea of time is like his treatment of the idea of space, in that our proper idea of time is like a secondary quality, grounded in our mental operations, not a primary quality grounded in some external phenomenon beyond our experience. (1) He first maintains that we have no idea of infinitely divisible time (Treatise, (2) He then notes Locke’s point that our minds operate at a range of speeds that are “fix’d by the original nature and constitution of the mind, and beyond which no influence of external objects on the senses is ever able to hasten or retard our thought” (Treatise, The idea of time, then, is not a simple idea derived from a simple impression; instead, it is a copy of impressions as they are perceived by the mind at its fixed speed (Treatise, (3) In contrast to this limited view of time, he argues that we frequently entertain a faulty notion of time that does not involve change or succession. The psychological account of this erroneous view is that we mistake time for the cause of succession instead of seeing it as the effect (Treatise,

c. Necessary Connection between Causes and Effects

According to Hume, the notion of cause-effect is a complex idea that is made up of three more foundational ideas: priority in time, proximity in space, and necessary connection. Concerning priority in time, if I say that event A causes event B, one thing I mean is that A occurs prior to B. If B were to occur before A, then it would be absurd to say that A was the cause of B. Concerning the idea of proximity, if I say that A causes B, then I mean that B is in proximity to, or close to A. For example, if I throw a rock, and at that moment someone’s window in China breaks, I would not conclude that my rock broke a window on the other side of the world. The broken window and the rock must be in proximity with each other. Priority and proximity alone, however, do not make up our entire notion of causality. For example, if I sneeze and the lights go out, I would not conclude that my sneeze was the cause, even though the conditions of priority and proximity were fulfilled. We also believe that there is a necessary connection between cause A and effect B. During the modern period of philosophy, philosophers thought of necessary connection as a power or force connecting two events. When billiard ball A strikes billiard ball B, there is a power that the one event imparts to the other. In keeping with his empiricist copy thesis, that all ideas are copied from impressions, Hume tries to uncover the experiences which give rise to our notions of priority, proximity, and necessary connection. The first two are easy to explain. Priority traces back to our various experiences of time. Proximity traces back to our various experiences of space. But what is the experience which gives us the idea of necessary connection? This notion of necessary connection is the specific focus of Hume’s analysis of cause-effect.

Hume’s view is that our proper idea of necessary connection is like a secondary quality that is formed by the mind, and not, like a primary quality, a feature of the external world. (1) He skeptically argues that we cannot get an idea of necessary connection by observing it through sensory experiences (Treatise, ff.). We have no external sensory impression of causal power when we observe cause-effect relationships; all that we ever see is cause A constantly conjoined with effect B. Neither does it arise from an internal impression, such as when we introspectively reflect on willed bodily motions or willing the creation of thoughts. These internal experiences are too elusive, and nothing in them can give content to our idea of necessary connection. (2) The idea we have of necessary connection arises as follows: we experience a constant conjunction of events A and B— repeated sense experiences where events resembling A are always followed by events resembling B. This produces a habit such that upon any further appearance of A, we expect B to follow. This, in turn, produces an internal feeling of expectation “to pass from an object to the idea of its usual attendant,” which is the impression from which the idea of necessary connection is copied (Treatise, (3) A common but mistaken notion on this topic is that necessity resides within the objects themselves. He explains this mistaken belief by the natural tendency we have to impute subjectively perceived qualities to external things (Treatise,

d. External Objects


Hume’s view on external objects is that the mind is programmed to form some concept of the external world, although this concept or idea is really just a fabrication. (1) Hume’s skeptical claim here is that we have no valid conception of the existence of external things (Treatise, (2) Nevertheless, he argues that we have an unavoidable “vulgar” or common belief in the continued existence of objects, and this idea he accounts for. His explanation is lengthy, but involves the following features. Perceptions of objects are disjointed and have no unity in and of themselves (Treatise, In an effort to organize our perceptions, we first naturally assume that there is no distinction between our perceptions and the objects that are perceived (this is the so-called “vulgar” view of perception). We then conflate all ideas (of perceptions), which put our minds in similar dispositions (Treatise,; that is, we associate resembling ideas and attribute identity to their causes. Consequently, we naturally invent the continued and external existence of the objects (or perceptions) that produced these ideas (Treatise, Lastly, we go on to believe in the existence of these objects because of the force of the resemblance between ideas (Treatise, Although this belief is philosophically unjustified, Hume feels he has given an accurate account of how we inevitably arrive at the idea of external existence. (3) In contrast to the previous explanation of this idea, he recommends that we doubt a more sophisticated but erroneous notion of existence—the so-called philosophical view—which distinguishes between perceptions and the external objects that cause perceptions. The psychological motivation for accepting this view is this: our imagination tells us that resembling perceptions have a continued existence, yet our reflection tells us that they are interrupted. Appealing to both forces, we ascribe interruption to perceptions and continuance to objects (Treatise,

e. Personal Identity

Regarding the issue of personal identity, (1) Hume’s skeptical claim is that we have no experience of a simple, individual impression that we can call the self—where the “self” is the totality of a person’s conscious life. He writes, “For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I never can catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe anything but the perception” (Treatise, (2) Even though my perceptions are fleeting and I am a bundle of different perceptions, I nevertheless have some idea of personal identity, and that must be accounted for (Treatise, Because of the associative principles, the resemblance or causal connection within the chain of my perceptions gives rise to an idea of myself, and memory extends this idea past my immediate perceptions (Treatise, ff.). (3) A common abuse of the notion of personal identity occurs when the idea of a soul or unchanging substance is added to give us a stronger or more unified concept of the self (Treatise,

f. Free Will

On the issue of free will and determinism—or “liberty” and “necessity” in Hume’s terminology—Hume defends necessity. (1) He first argues that “all actions of the will have particular causes” (Treatise,, and so there is no such thing as an uncaused willful action. (2) He then defends the notion of a will that consistently responds to prior motivational causes: “our actions have a constant union with our motives, tempers, and circumstances” (Treatise, These motives produce actions that have the same causal necessity observed in cause-effect relations that we see in external objects, such as when billiard ball A strikes and moves billiard ball B. In the same way, we regularly observe the rock-solid connection between motive A and action B, and we rely on that predictable connection in our normal lives. Suppose that a traveler, in recounting his observation of the odd behavior of natives in a distant country, told us that identical motives led to entirely different actions among these natives.  We would not believe the traveler’s report. In business, politics, and military affairs, our leaders expect predicable behavior from us insofar as the same motives within us will always result in us performing the same action. A prisoner who is soon to be executed will assume that the motivations and actions of the prison guards and the executioner are so rigidly fixed that these people will mechanically carry out their duties and perform the execution, with no chance of a change of heart (Treatise, ff.).  (3) Lastly, Hume explains why people commonly believe in an uncaused will (Treatise, ff.). One explanation is that people erroneously believe they have a feeling of liberty when performing actions. The reason is that, when we perform actions, we feel a kind of “looseness or indifference” in how they come about, and some people wrongly see this as “an intuitive proof of human liberty” (Treatise,

In the Treatise Hume rejects the notion of liberty completely. While he gives no definition of “liberty” in that work, he argues that the notion is incompatible with necessity, and, at best, “liberty” simply means chance. In the Enquiry, however, he takes a more compatiblist approach. All human actions are caused by specific prior motives, but liberty and necessity are reconcilable when we define liberty as “a power of acting or not acting, according to the determinations of the will” (Enquiry, 8). Nothing in this definition of liberty is in conflict with the notion of necessity.

4. Skepticism

In all of the above discussions on epistemological topics, Hume performs a balancing act between making skeptical attacks (step 1) and offering positive theories based on natural beliefs (step 2). In the conclusion to Book 1, though, he appears to elevate his skepticism to a higher level and exposes the inherent contradictions in even his best philosophical theories. He notes three such contradictions. One centers on what we call induction. Our judgments based on past experience all contain elements of doubt; we are then impelled to make a judgment about that doubt, and since this judgment is also based on past experience it will in turn produce a new doubt. Once again, though, we are impelled to make a judgment about this second doubt, and the cycle continues. He concludes that “no finite object can subsist under a decrease repeated in infinitum.” A second contradiction involves a conflict between two theories of external perception, each of which our natural reasoning process leads us to.  One is our natural inclination to believe that we are directly seeing objects as they really are, and the other is the more philosophical view that we only ever see mental images or copies of external objects. The third contradiction involves a conflict between causal reasoning and belief in the continued existence of matter. After listing these contradictions, Hume despairs over the failure of his metaphysical reasoning:

The intense view of these manifold contradictions and imperfections in human reason has so wrought upon me, and heated my brain, that I am ready to reject all belief and reasoning, and can look upon no opinion even as more probable or likely than another [Treatise,].

He then pacifies his despair by recognizing that nature forces him to set aside his philosophical speculations and return to the normal activities of common life. He sees, though, that in time he will be drawn back into philosophical speculation in order to attack superstition and educate the world.

Hume’s emphasis on these conceptual contradictions is a unique aspect of his skepticism, and if any part of his philosophy can be designated “Humean skepticism” it is this.  However, during the course of his writing the Treatise his view of the nature of these contradictions changed. At first he felt that these contradictions were restricted to theories about the external world, but theories about the mind itself would be free from them, as he explains here:

The essence and composition of external bodies are so obscure, that we must necessarily, in our reasonings, or rather conjectures concerning them, involve ourselves in contradictions and absurdities. But as the perceptions of the mind are perfectly known, and I have us'd all imaginable caution in forming conclusions concerning them, I have always hop'd to keep clear of those contradictions, which have attended every other system [Treatise,].

When composing the Appendix to the Treatise a year later, he changed his mind and felt that theories about the mind would also have contradictions:

I had entertained some hopes, that however deficient our theory of the intellectual world might be, it wou'd be free from those contradictions, and absurdities, which seem to attend every explication, that human reason can give of the material world. But upon a more strict review of the section concerning I find myself involv'd in such a labyrinth, that, I must confess, I neither know how to correct my former opinions, nor how to render them consistent. If this be not a good general reason for scepticism, 'tis at least a sufficient one (if I were not already abundantly supplied) for me to entertain a diffidence and modesty in all my decisions [Treatise, Appendix].

Thus, in the Treatise, the skeptical bottom line is that even our best theories about both physical and mental phenomena will be plagued with contradictions. In the concluding section of his Enquiry, Hume again addresses the topic of skepticism, but treats the matter somewhat differently: he rejects extreme skepticism but accepts skepticism in a more moderate form. He associates extreme Pyrrhonian skepticism with blanket attacks on all reasoning about the external world, abstract reasoning about space and time, or causal reasoning about matters of fact. He argues, though, that we must reject such skepticism since “no durable good can ever result from it.” Instead, he recommends a more moderate or Academic skepticism that tones down Pyrrhonism by, first, exercising caution and modesty in our judgments, and, second,  by restricting our speculations to abstract reasoning and matters of fact.

5. Theory of the Passions



Like many philosophers of his time, Hume developed a theory of the passions—that is, the emotions—categorizing them and explaining the psychological mechanisms by which they arise in the human mind. His most detailed account is in Book Two of the Treatise. Passions, according to Hume, fall under the category of impressions of reflection (as opposed to impressions of sensation). He opens his discussion with a taxonomy of types of passions, which are outlined here:

Reflective Impressions

1. Calm (reflective pleasures and pains)

2. Violent

a. Direct (desire, aversion, joy, grief, hope, fear)

b. Indirect (love, hate, pride, humility)

He initially divides passions between the calm and the violent. He concedes that this distinction is imprecise, but he explains that people commonly distinguish between types of passions in terms of their degrees of forcefulness. Adding more precision to this common distinction, he maintains that calm passions are emotional feelings of pleasure and pain associated with moral and aesthetic judgments. For example, when I see a person commit a horrible deed, I will experience a feeling of pain. When I view a good work of art, I will experience a feeling of pleasure. In contrast to the calm passions, violent ones constitute the bulk of our emotions, and these divide between direct and indirect passions. For Hume, the key direct passions are desire, aversion, joy, grief, hope, and fear.  They are called “direct” because they arise immediately—without complex reflection on our part—whenever we see something good or bad. For example, if I consider an unpleasant thing, such as being burglarized, then I will feel the passion of aversion. He suggests that sometimes these passions are sparked instinctively—for example, by  my desire for food when I am hungry. Others, though, are not connected with instinct and are more the result of social conditioning. There is an interesting logic to the six direct passions, which Hume borrowed from a tradition that can be traced to ancient Greek Stoicism. We can diagram the relation between the six with this chart:

When good/bad objects are considered abstractly

Desire (towards good objects)

Aversion (towards evil objects)

When good/bad objects are actually present

Joy (towards good objects)

Grief (towards evil objects)

When good/bad objects are only anticipated

Hope (towards good objects)

Fear (towards evil objects)

Compare, for example, the passions that I will experience regarding winning the lottery vs. having my house burglarized. Suppose that I consider them purely in the abstract—or “consider’d simply” as Hume says (Treatise, I will then desire to win the lottery and have an aversion towards being burglarized. Suppose that both situations are actually before me; I will then experience joy over winning the lottery and grief over being burglarized. Suppose, finally, that I know that at some unknown time in the future I will win the lottery and be burglarized. I will then experience hope regarding the lottery and fear of being burglarized.

Hume devotes most of Book 2 to an analysis of the indirect passions, his unique contribution to theories of the passions. The four principal passions are love, hate, pride, and humility. They are called “indirect” since they are the secondary effects of a previous feeling of pleasure and pain. Suppose, for example, that I paint a picture, which gives me a feeling of pleasure. Since I am the artist, I will then experience an additional feeling of pride. He explains in detail the psychological process that triggers indirect passions such as pride. Specifically, he argues that these passions arise from a double relation between ideas and impressions, which we can illustrate here with the passion of pride:

1. I have an initial idea of some possession, or “subject”, such as my painting, and this idea gives me pleasure.

2. Through the associative principle of resemblance, I then immediately associate this feeling of pleasure with a resembling feeling of pride (this association constitutes the first relation in the double relation).

3. This feeling of pride then causes me to have an idea of myself, as the “object” of pride.

4. Through some associative principle such as causality, I then associate the idea of myself with the idea of my painting, which is the “subject” of my pride (this association constitutes the second relation in the double relation).

According to Hume, the three other principal indirect passions arise in parallel ways. For example, if my painting is ugly and causes me pain, then I will experience the secondary passion of humility—perhaps more accurately expressed as “humiliation”. By contrast, if someone else paints a pleasing picture, then this will trigger in me a feeling of love for that artist—perhaps more accurately expressed as “esteem”. If the artist paints a painfully ugly picture, then this will trigger in me a feeling of “hatred” towards the artist—perhaps more accurately expressed as “disesteem”.

One of the most lasting contributions of Hume’s discussion of the passions is his argument that human actions must be prompted by passion, and never can be motivated by reason. Reason, he argues, is completely inert when it comes to motivating conduct, and without some emotion we would not engage in any action. Thus, he writes, “Reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions, and can never pretend to any other office than to serve and obey them” (Treatise,

6. Religious Belief

Like many of Hume’s philosophical views, his position on religious belief is also skeptical. Critics of religion during the eighteenth-century needed to express themselves cautiously to avoid being fined, imprisoned, or worse. Sometimes this involved placing controversial views in the mouth of a character in a dialogue. Other times it involved adopting the persona of a deist or fideist as a means of concealing a more extreme religious skepticism. Hume used all of the rhetorical devices at his disposal, and left it to his readers to decode his most controversial conclusions on religious subjects. During the Enlightenment, there were two pillars of traditional Christian belief: natural and revealed religion. Natural religion involves knowledge of God drawn from nature through the use of logic and reason, and typically involves logical proofs regarding the existence and nature of God, such as the causal and design arguments for God’s existence. Revealed religion involves knowledge of God contained in revelation, particularly the Bible, the quintessential examples of which are biblical prophesies and miracles where God intervenes in earthly affairs to confirm the Bible’s message of salvation. Hume attacks both natural and revealed religious beliefs in his various writings.

a. Miracles


In a 1737 letter to Henry Home, Hume states that he intended to include a discussion of miracles in his Treatise, but ultimately left it out for fear of offending readers. His analysis of the subject eventually appeared some ten years later in his essay “Of Miracles” from the Enquiry, and is his first sustained attack on revealed religion. It is probably this main argument to which Hume refers. The first of this two-part essay contains the argument for which Hume is most famous: uniform experience of natural law outweighs the testimony of any alleged miracle. Let us imagine a scale with two balancing pans. In the first pan we place the strongest evidence in support of the occurrence of a miracle. In the second we place our life-long experience of consistent laws of nature. According to Hume, the second pan will always outweigh the first. He writes:

It is experience only, which gives authority to human testimony [regarding miracles]; and it is the same experience, which assures us of the laws of nature. When, therefore, these two kinds of experience are contrary, we have nothing to do but subtract the one from the other, and embrace an opinion, either on one side or the other, with that assurance which arises from the remainder. But according to the principle here explained, this subtraction, with regard to all popular religions, amounts to an entire annihilation [Enquiry, 10.1].

Regardless of how strong the testimony is in favor of a given miracle, it can never come close to counterbalancing the overwhelming experience of unvaried laws of nature. Thus, proportioning one’s belief to the evidence, the wise person must reject the weaker evidence concerning the alleged miracle.

In the second part of “Of Miracles”, Hume discusses four factors that count against the credibility of most miracle testimonies: (1) witnesses of miracles typically lack integrity; (2) we are naturally inclined to enjoy sensational stories, and this has us uncritically perpetuate miracle accounts; (3) miracle testimonies occur most often in less civilized countries; and (4) miracles support rival religious systems and thus discredit each other. But even if a miracle testimony is not encumbered by these four factors, we should still not believe it since it would be contrary to our consistent experience of laws of nature. He concludes his essay with the following cryptic comment about Christian belief in biblical miracles:

upon the whole, we may conclude, that the Christian Religion not only was at first attended with miracles, but even at this day cannot be believed by any reasonable person without one. Mere reason is insufficient to convince us of its veracity: And whoever is moved by Faith to assent to it, is conscious of a continued miracle in his own person, which subverts all the principles of his understanding, and gives him a determination to believe what is most contrary to custom and experience [Enquiry, 10.2].

At face value, his comment suggests a fideist approach to religious belief such as what Pascal recommends. That is, reason is incapable of establishing religious belief, and God must perform a miracle in our lives to make us open to belief through faith. However, according to the eighteenth-century Hume critic John Briggs, Hume’s real point is that belief in Christianity requires “miraculous stupidity” (The Nature of Religious Zeal, 1775).

b. Psychology of Religious Belief

Another attack on revealed religion appears in Hume’s essay “The Natural History of Religion” (1757). It is one of the first systematic attempts to explain the causes of religious belief solely in terms of psychological and sociological factors. We might see the “Natural History” as an answer to a challenge, such as the sort that William Adams poses here in his attack on Hume’s “Of Miracles”:

Whence could the religion and laws of this people [i.e., the Jews] so far exceed those of the wisest Heathens, and come out at once, in their first infancy, thus perfect and entire; when all human systems are found to grow up by degrees, and to ripen, after many improvements; into perfection [An Essay, Part 2]?

According to Adams, only divine intervention can account for the sophistication of the ancient Jewish religion. In the “Natural History,” though, Hume offers an alternative explanation, and one that is grounded solely in human nature, without God’s direct involvement in human history.

The work may be divided into three parts. In the first (Sections 1 and 4), Hume argues that polytheism, and not monotheism, was the original religion of primitive humans. Monotheism, he believes, was only a later development that emerged with the progress of various societies. The standard theory in Judeo-Christian theology was that early humans first believed in a single God, but as religious corruption crept in, people lapsed into polytheism. Hume was the first writer to systematically defend the position of original polytheism. In the second part (Sections 2-3, 5-8), Hume establishes the psychological principles that give rise to popular religious belief. His thesis is that natural instincts—such as fear and the propensity to adulate—are the true causes of popular religious belief, and not divine intervention or rational argument. The third part of this work (Sections 9-15) compares various aspects of polytheism with monotheism, showing that one is no more superior than the other. Both contain points of absurdity. From this he concludes that we should suspend belief on the entire subject of religious truth.

c. Arguments for God’s Existence

Around the same time that Hume was composing his “Natural History of Religion” he was also working on his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, which appeared in print two decades later, after his death. As the title of the work implies, it is a critique of natural religion, in contrast with revealed religion. There are three principal characters in the Dialogues. A character named Cleanthes, who espouses religious empiricism, defends the design argument for God’s existence, but rejects the causal argument. Next, a character named Demea, who is a religious rationalist, defends the causal argument for God’s existence, but rejects the design argument. Finally, a character named Philo, who is a religious skeptic, argues against both the design and causal arguments. The main assaults on theistic proofs are conveyed by both Cleanthes and Philo, and, to that extent, both of their critiques likely represent Hume’s views.

The specific version of the causal argument that Hume examines is one by Samuel Clarke (and Leibniz before him). Simplistic versions of the causal argument maintain that when we trace back the causes of things in the universe, the chain of causes cannot go back in time to infinity past; there must be a first cause to the causal sequence, which is God. Clarke’s version differs in that it is theoretically possible for causal sequences of events to trace back through time to infinity past. Thus, we cannot argue that God’s existence is required to initiate a sequence of temporal causes. Nevertheless, Clarke argued, an important fact still needs to be explained: the fact that this infinite temporal sequence of causal events exists at all. Why does something exist rather than nothing? God, then, is the necessary cause of the whole series. In response, the character Cleanthes argues that the flaw in the cosmological argument consists in assuming that there is some larger fact about the universe that needs explaining beyond the particular items in the series itself. Once we have a sufficient explanation for each particular fact in the infinite sequence of events, it makes no sense to inquire about the origin of the collection of these facts. That is, once we adequately account for each individual fact, this constitutes a sufficient explanation of the whole collection. He writes, “Did I show you the particular causes of each individual in a collection of twenty particles of matter, I should think it very unreasonable, should you afterwards ask me, what was the cause of the whole twenty” (Dialogues, 9).

The design argument for God’s existence is that the appearance of design in the natural world is evidence for the existence of a divine designer. The specific version of the argument that Hume examines is one from analogy, as stated here by Cleanthes:

The curious adapting of means to ends, throughout all nature, resembles exactly, though it much exceeds, the productions of human contrivance; of human designs, thought, wisdom, and intelligence. Since, therefore, the effects resemble each other, we are led to infer, by all the rules of analogy, that the causes also resemble; and that the Author of Nature is somewhat similar to the mind of man (Dialogues, 2).

Philo presents several criticisms against the design argument, many of which are now standard in discussions of the issue. According to Philo, the design argument is based on a faulty analogy: we do not know whether the order in nature was the result of design, since, unlike our experience with the creation of machines, we did not witness the formation of the world. In Philo’s words, “will any man tell me with a serious countenance, that an orderly universe must arise from some thought and art like the human, because we have experience of it? To ascertain this reasoning, it were requisite that we had experience of the origin of worlds; and it is not sufficient, surely, that we have seen ships and cities arise from human art and contrivance” (ibid). Further, the vastness of the universe also weakens any comparison with human artifacts. Although the universe is orderly here, it may be chaotic elsewhere. Similarly, if intelligent design is exhibited only in a small fraction of the universe, then we cannot say that it is the productive force of the whole universe. Philo states that “A very small part of this great system, during a very short time, is very imperfectly discovered to us; and do we thence pronounce decisively concerning the origin of the whole?” (ibid). Philo also argues that natural design may be accounted for by nature alone, insofar as matter may contain within itself a principle of order, and “This at once solves all difficulties” (Dialogues, 6). And even if the design of the universe is of divine origin, we are not justified in concluding that this divine cause is a single, all powerful, or all good being. According to Philo, “Whether all these attributes are united in one subject, or dispersed among several independent beings, by what phenomena in nature can we pretend to decide the controversy?” (Dialogues 5).

7. Moral Theory

Hume’s moral theory appears in Book 3 of the Treatise and in An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751). He opens his discussion in the Treatise by telling us what moral approval is not: it is not a rational judgment about either conceptual relations or empirical facts. To make his case he criticizes Samuel Clarke’s rationalistic account of morality, which is that we rationally judge the fitness or unfitness of our actions in reference to eternal laws of righteousness, that are self-evidently known to all humans, just as is our knowledge of mathematical relations. Hume presents several arguments against Clarke’s view, one of which is an analogy from arboreal parricide: a young tree that overgrows and kills its parent exhibits the same alleged relations as a human child killing his parent. “Is not the one tree the cause of the other’s existence; and the latter the cause of the destruction of the former, in the same manner as when a child murders his parent?” (Treatise, If morality is a question of relations, then the young tree is immoral, which is absurd. Hume also argues that moral assessments are not judgments about empirical facts. Take any immoral action, such as willful murder: “examine it in all lights, and see if you can find that matter of fact, or real existence, which you call vice” (Treatise, You will not find any such fact, but only your own feelings of disapproval. In this context Hume makes his point that we cannot derive statements of obligation from statements of fact. When surveying various moral theories, Hume writes, “I am surpriz’d to find, that instead of the usual copulations of propositions, is, and is not, I meet with no proposition that is not connected with an ought or an ought not” (Treatise, This move from is to ought is illegitimate, he argues, and is why people erroneously believe that morality is grounded in rational judgments.

Thus far Hume has only told us what moral approval is not, namely a judgment of reason. So what then does moral approval consist of? It is an emotional response, not a rational one. The details of this part of his theory rest on a distinction between three psychologically distinct players: the moral agent, the receiver, and the moral spectator. The moral agent is the person who performs an action, such as stealing a car; the receiver is the person impacted by the conduct, such as the owner of the stolen car; and the moral spectator is the person who observes and, in this case, disapproves of the agent’s action. This agent-receiver-spectator distinction is the product of earlier moral sense theories championed by the Earl of Shaftesbury (1671-1713), Joseph Butler (1692-1752), and Francis Hutcheson (1694-1747). Most generally, moral sense theories maintained that humans have a faculty of moral perception, similar to our faculties of sensory perception. Just as our external senses detect qualities in external objects, such as colors and shapes, so too does our moral faculty detect good and bad moral qualities in people and actions.

For Hume, all actions of a moral agent are motivated by character traits, specifically either virtuous or vicious character traits. For example, if you donate money to a charity, then your action is motivated by a virtuous character trait. Hume argues that some virtuous character traits are instinctive or natural, such as benevolence, and others are acquired or artificial, such as justice. As an agent, your action will have an effect on a receiver. For example, if you as the agent give food to a starving person, then the receiver will experience an immediately agreeable feeling from your act. Also, the receiver may see the usefulness of your food donation, insofar as eating food will improve his health. When considering the usefulness of your food donation, then, the receiver will receive another agreeable feeling from your act. Finally, I, as a spectator, observe these agreeable feelings that the receiver experiences. I, then, will sympathetically experience agreeable feelings along with the receiver. These sympathetic feelings of pleasure constitute my moral approval of the original act of charity that you, the agent, perform. By sympathetically experiencing this pleasure, I thereby pronounce your motivating character trait to be a virtue, as opposed to a vice. Suppose, on the other hand, that you as an agent did something to hurt the receiver, such as steal his car. I as the spectator would then sympathetically experience the receiver’s pain and thereby pronounce your motivating character trait to be a vice, as opposed to a virtue.

In short, that is Hume’s overall theory. There are, though, some important details that should also be mentioned. First, it is tricky to determine whether an agent’s motivating character trait is natural or artificial, and Hume decides this one virtue at a time. For Hume, the natural virtues include benevolence, meekness, charity, and generosity. By contrast, the artificial virtues include justice, keeping promises, allegiance and chastity. Contrary to what one might expect, Hume classifies the key virtues that are necessary for a well-ordered state as artificial, and he classifies only the more supererogatory virtues as natural. Hume’s critics were quick to point out this paradox. Second, to spark a feeling of moral approval, the spectator does not have to actually witness the effect of an agent’s action upon a receiver. The spectator might simply hear about it, or the spectator might even simply invent an entire scenario and think about the possible effects of hypothetical actions. This happens when we have moral reactions when reading works of fiction: “a very play or romance may afford us instances of this pleasure, which virtue conveys to us; and pain, which arises from vices” (Treatise,

Third, although the agent, receiver, and spectator have psychologically distinct roles, in some situations a single person may perform more than one of these roles. For example, if I as an agent donate to charity, as a spectator to my own action I can also sympathize with the effect of my donation on the receiver. Finally, given various combinations of spectators and receivers, Hume concludes that there are four irreducible categories of qualities that exhaustively constitute moral virtue: (1) qualities useful to others, which include benevolence, meekness, charity, justice, fidelity and veracity; (2) qualities useful to oneself, which include industry, perseverance, and patience; (3) qualities immediately agreeable to others, which include wit, eloquence and cleanliness; and (4) qualities immediately agreeable to oneself, which include good humor, self-esteem and pride. For Hume, most morally significant qualities and actions seem to fall into more than one of these categories. When Hume spoke about an agent’s “useful” consequences, he often used the word “utility” as a synonym. This is particularly so in the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals where the term “utility” appears over 50 times. Moral theorists after Hume thus depicted his moral theory as the “theory of utility”—namely, that morality involves assessing the pleasing and painful consequences of actions on the receiver. It is this concept and terminology that inspired classic utilitarian philosophers, such as Jeremy Bentham (1748–1832).

8. Aesthetic, Political, and Economic Theory


Hume wrote two influential essays on the subject of aesthetic theory. In “Of Tragedy” (1757) he discusses the psychological reasons why we enjoy observing depictions of tragic events in theatrical production. He argues that “the energy of expression, the power of numbers, and the charm of imitation” convey the sense of pleasure. He particularly stresses the technical artistry involved when an artistic work imitates the original. In “Of the Standard of Taste” (1757) he argues that there is a uniform sense of artistic judgment in human nature, similar to our uniform sense of moral judgment. Specific objects consistently trigger feelings of beauty within us, as our human nature dictates. Just as we can refine our external senses such as our palate, we can also refine our sense of artistic beauty and thus cultivate a delicacy of taste. In spite of this uniform standard of taste, two factors create some difference in our judgments: “the one is the different humours of particular men; the other, the particular manners and opinions of our age and country.”

In political theory, Hume has both theoretical discussions on the origins of government and more informal essays on popular political controversies of his day. In his theoretical discussions, he attacks two basic notions in eighteenth-century political philosophy: the social contract and the instinctive nature of justice regarding private property. In his 1748 essay “Of the Original Contract,” he argues that political allegiance is not grounded in any social contract, but instead on our general observation that society cannot be maintained without a governmental system. He concedes that in savage times there may have been an unwritten contract among tribe members for the sake of peace and order. However, he argues, this was no permanent basis of government as social contract theorists pretend. There is nothing to transmit that original contract onwards from generation to generation, and our experience of actual political events shows that governmental authority is founded on conquest, not elections or consent. We do not even tacitly consent to a contract since many of us have no real choice about remaining in our countries: “Can we seriously say that a poor peasant or artisan has a free choice to leave his country, when he knows no foreign language or manners, and lives from day to day by the small wages which he acquires?” Political allegiance, he concludes, is ultimately based on a primary instinct of selfishness, and only through reflection will we see how we benefit from an orderly society.

Concerning private property, in both the Treatise and the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751), Hume in essence argues against Locke’s notion of the natural right to private property. For Hume, we have no primary instinct to recognize private property, and all conceptions of justice regarding property are founded solely on how useful the convention of property is to us. We can see how property ownership is tied to usefulness when considering scenarios concerning the availability of necessities. When necessities are in overabundance, I can take what I want any time, and there is no usefulness in my claiming any property as my own. When the opposite happens and necessities are scarce, I do not acknowledge anyone’s claim to property and take what I want from others for my own survival. Thus, “the rules of equity or justice [regarding property] depend entirely on the particular state and condition in which men are placed, and owe their origin and existence to that utility, which results to the public from their strict and regular observance” (Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, 3). Further, if we closely inspect human nature, we will never find a primary instinct that inclines us to acknowledge private property. It is nothing like the primary instinct of nest building in birds. While the sense of justice regarding private property is a firmly fixed habit, it is nevertheless its usefulness to society that gives it value.

As for Hume’s informal essays on popular political controversies, several of these involve party disputes between the politically conservative Tory party that supported a strong monarchy, and the politically liberal Whig party which supported a constitutional government. Two consistent themes emerge in these essays. First, in securing peace, a monarchy with strong authority is probably better than a pure republic. Hume sides with the Tories because of their traditional support of the monarchy. Except in extreme cases, he opposes the Lockean argument offered by Whigs that justifies overthrowing political authorities when those authorities fail to protect the rights of the people. Hume notes, though, that monarchies and republics each have their strong points. Monarchies encourage the arts, and republics encourage science and trade. Hume also appreciates the mixed form of government within Great Britain, which fosters liberty of the press. The second theme in Hume’s political essays is that revolutions and civil wars principally arise from zealousness within party factions. Political moderation, he argues, is the best antidote to potentially ruinous party conflict.

In economic theory, Hume wrote influential essays on money, interest, trade, credit, and taxes. Many of these target the mercantile system and its view that a country increases its wealth by increasing the quantity of gold and silver in that country. For mercantilists, three means were commonly employed to this end: (1) capture gold, silver and raw material from other countries through colonization; (2) discourage imports through tariffs and monopolies, which keeps acquired gold and silver within one’s country’s borders; and, (3) increase exports, which brings in money from outside countries. In Great Britain, mercantile policies were instituted through the Navigation Acts, which prohibited trade between British colonies and foreign countries. These protectionist laws ultimately led to the American Revolution. The most famous of Hume’s anti-mercantilist arguments is now called Hume’s gold-flow theory, and appears in his essays “Of Money” (1752) and “Of the Balance of Trade” (1752). Contrary to mercantilists who advocated locking up money in one’s home country, Hume argued that increased money in one country automatically disperses to other countries. Suppose, for example, that Great Britain receives an influx of new money. This new money will drive up prices of labor and domestic products in Great Britain. Products in foreign countries, then, will be cheaper than in Great Britain; Britain, then, will import these products, thereby sending new money to foreign countries. Hume compares this reshuffling of wealth to the level of fluids in interconnected chambers: if I add fluid to one chamber, then, under the weight of gravity, this will disperse to the others until the level is the same in all chambers. A similar phenomenon will occur if we lose money in our home country by purchasing imports from foreign countries. As the quantity of money decreases in our home country, this will drive down the prices of labor and domestic products. Our products, then, will be cheaper than foreign products, and we will gain money through exports. On the fluid analogy, by removing fluid from one chamber, more fluid is drawn in from surrounding chambers.

9. History and Philosophy

Although Hume is now remembered mainly as a philosopher, in his own day he had at least as much impact as a historian. His History of England appeared in four installments between 1754 and 1762 and covers the periods of British history from most ancient times through the seventeenth-century. To his 18th and 19th century readers, he was not just another historian, but a uniquely philosophical historian who had an ability to look into the minds of historical figures and uncover the motives behind their conduct. A political theme underlying the whole History is, once again, a conflict between Tory and Whig ideology. In the Britain of Hume’s day, a major point of contention between the two parties was whether the English government was historically an absolute or limited monarchy. Tories believed that it was traditionally absolute, with governmental authority being grounded in royal prerogative. Whigs, on the other hand, believed that it was traditionally limited, with the foundation of government resting in the individual liberty of the people, as expressed in the parliamentary voice of the commons. As a historian, Hume felt that he was politically moderate, tending to see both the strengths and weaknesses in opposing viewpoints:

With regard to politics and the character of princes and great men, I think I am very moderate. My views of things are more conformable to Whig principles; my representations of persons to Tory prejudices. Nothing can so much prove that men commonly regard more persons than things, as to find that I am commonly numbered among the Tories [Hume to John Clephane, 1756].

However, to radical Whig British readers, Hume was a conservative Tory who defended royal prerogative.

Hume takes two distinct positions on the prerogative issue. From a theoretical and idealistic perspective, he favored a mixed constitution, mediating between the authority of the monarch and that of the Parliament. Discussing this issue in his 1741 Essays, he holds that we should learn “the lesson of moderation in all our political controversies.” However, from the perspective of how British history actually unfolded, he emphasized royal prerogative. And, as a “philosophical historian,” he tried to show how human nature gave rise to the tendency towards royal prerogative. In his brief autobiography, “My Own Life,” he says that he rejected the “senseless clamour” of Whig ideology, and believed “It is ridiculous to consider the English constitution before that period [of the Stuart Monarchs] as a regular plan of liberty.” Gilbert Stuart best encapsulated Hume’s historical stance on the prerogative issue: “his history, from its beginning to its conclusion, is chiefly to be regarded as a plausible defence of prerogative” (A View of Society in Europe, 1778, 2.1.1). In short, Hume’s Tory narrative is this. As early as the Anglo Saxon period, the commons did not participate in the king’s advisory council. The Witenagemot, for example, was only a council of nobles and bishops, which the king could listen to or ignore as he saw fit. Throughout the succeeding centuries, England’s great kings were those who exercised absolute rule, and took advantage of prerogative courts such as the Star Chamber. Elizabeth—England’s most beloved monarch—was in fact a tyrant, and her reign was much like that of a Turkish sultan. Charles I—a largely virtuous man—tried to follow in her footsteps as a strong monarch. After a few minor lapses in judgment, and a few too many concessions to Catholics, Protestant zealots rose up against him, and he was ultimately executed. To avoid over-characterizing royal prerogative, Hume occasionally condemns arbitrary actions of monarchs and praises efforts for preserving liberty. Nevertheless, Whig critics like Gilbert Stuart argued that Hume’s emphasis was decisively in favor of prerogative.

There is an irony to Hume’s preference for prerogative over civil liberty. His philosophical writings were among the most controversial pieces of literature of the time, and would have been impossible to publish if Britain was not a friend to liberty. Although Hume was certainly no enemy to liberty, he believed that it was best achieved through moderation rather than Whig radicalism. He writes, “If any other rule than established practice be followed, factions and dissentions must multiply without end” (History, Appendix 3). To Hume’s way of thinking, the loudest voices favoring liberty were Calvinistic religious fanatics who accomplished little more than dissention. A strong, centralized and moderating force was the best way to avoid factious disruption from the start.

10. References and Further Reading

a. Recent Editions of Hume’s Writings

There are many published editions of Hume’s writings, the best of which are as follows (listed chronologically).

  • The Philosophical Works of David Hume (1874-1875), ed. T.H. Green and T.H. Grose.
    • This four-volume set was the definitive edition of the late nineteenth century, and is the text source of many individually published books on Hume. It does not include the History. Electronic versions of this edition are freely available on the internet.
  • Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (1935), ed., Norman Kemp Smith.
    • This is the definitive edition of this work, and contains a ground-breaking introductory essay.
  • Enquiries (Oxford, 1975) ed. L.A. Selby-Bigge and P.H. Nidditch.
    • This contains Hume’s two Enquiries, and was the definitive edition of these works in the late twentieth-century.
  • Treatise of Human Nature (Oxford, 1978), ed. L.A. Selby-Bigge and P.H. Nidditch.
    • This was the definitive edition of this work in the late twentieth-century.
  • History of England (Liberty Classics, 1983).
    • This is the definitive edition of this work.
  • Essays, Moral, Political and Literary (Liberty Classics, 1987), ed. E.F. Miller.
    • This is the definitive edition of this work.
  • The Clarendon Edition of the Works of David Hume (1998-ongoing), ed. Tom L. Beauchamp, Mark Box, David Fate Norton, Mary Norton, M.A. Stewart.
    • This is a carefully-researched critical edition of Hume’s philosophical works, and supersedes all previous editions. Volumes on Hume’s Essays and the Dialogues are forthcoming; it does not include Hume’s History.

b. Chronological List of Hume’s Publications

  • A Treatise of Human Nature: Being an Attempt to Introduce the Experimental Method of Reasoning into Moral Subjects (1739-40).
    • This was published anonymously in three volumes: Vol. I. Of the Understanding; Vol. II. Of the Passions. Vol. III. Of Morals. This is Hume’s principle philosophical work, the central notions of which were rewritten more popularly in Philosophical Essays Concerning Human Understanding (1748) and An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751).
  • An Abstract of a Book lately Published;  entituled, A Treatise of Human Nature, &c. Wherein the chief Argument  of that Book is farther Illustrated and Explained (1740).
    • This is a sixteen page pamphlet, published anonymously as an effort to bring attention to the Treatise.
  • Essays, Moral and Political (1741-1742).
    • This was published anonymously in two volumes in 1741 and 1742 respectively. In subsequent editions some essays were dropped and others added; the collection was eventually combined with his Political Discourses (1752) and retitled Essays, Moral, Political and Literary in Hume’s collection of philosophical works, Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects (1753).
  • A Letter from a Gentleman to his Friend in Edinburgh: Containing Some Observations on a Specimen of the Principles concerning Religion and Morality, said to be maintain’d in a Book lately publish’d, intituled, A Treatise of Human Nature, &c (1745).
    • This thirty-four page pamphlet was published anonymously and was prompted by Hume’s candidacy for the Chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Edinburgh. The pamphlet responds to criticisms regarding the Treatise.
  • Philosophical Essays Concerning Human Understanding. By the Author of the Essays Moral and Political (1748).
    • This was published anonymously and later retitled Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. It is a popularized version of key themes that appear mainly in the Treatise, Book 1.
  • A True Account of the Behaviour and conduct of Archibald Stewart, Esq; late Lord Provost of Edinburgh. In a letter to a Friend (1748).
    • This fifty-one page pamphlet was published anonymously as a defense of Archibald Stewart, Lord Provost of Edinburgh, surrounding a political controversy.
  • An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. By David Hume, Esq. (1751).
    • This is a popularized version of key themes that appear mainly in the Treatise, Book 3.
  • The Petition of the Grave and Venerable Bellmen (or Sextons) of the Church of Scotland (1751).
    • This was published anonymously and involved the Church of Scotland’s efforts to increase their stipends.
  • Political discourses. By David Hume Esq. (1752).
    • This is a collection of essays on economic and political subjects, which was eventually combined with his Essays Moral and Political (1741-1742) and retitled Essays, Moral, Political and Literary in Hume’s collection of philosophical works, Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects (1753).
  • Scotticisms (1752).
    • This six page pamphlet was published anonymously, and lists Scottish idioms.
  • The History of England, from the Invasion of Julius Cæsar to  the  Revolution in 1688 (1754-1762).
    • This was published in four installments: (a) The history of Great Britain. Vol. I.  Containing the reigns of James I. and Charles I. By David Hume, Esq. (1754); (b) The history of Great Britain. Vol. II.  Containing the Commonwealth, and the reigns of Charles II. and James  II. By David Hume, Esq. (1757); (c) The history of England, under the House of Tudor Comprehending the reigns of K. Henry VII. K. Henry VIII. K. Edward VI. Q. Mary, and Q. Elizabeth. . . .  By David Hume,  Esq (1759); (d) The history of England, from the invasion of Julius Cæsar to the  accession of Henry VII. . . .  By David Hume, Esq. (1762).
  • Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects. By David Hume, Esq; In four  volumes (1753).
    • This is Hume’s handpicked collection of philosophical works, which includes (a) Essays, Moral and Political, (b) Philosophical Essays concerning Human Understanding, (c) An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, and (d) Political Discourses. Essays from Four Dissertations (1757) were added to later editions. The collection does not include the Treatise.
  • Four Dissertations. I. The Natural History of Religion. II. Of the  Passions. III. Of Tragedy. IV. Of the Standard of Taste. By David Hume,  esq. (1757).
    • This volume was originally to include “Of Suicide” and “Of the Immortality of the Soul,” which were removed at the last minute and appeared separately in 1783 in an unauthorized posthumous edition. The four essays in Four Dissertations were later added to various sections of Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects.
  • Letter to Critical Review, April 1759, Vol. 7. pp. 323-334.
    • This is a defense of William Wilkie’s epic poem Epigoniad.
  • Exposé succinct de la contestation qui s’est élevée entre M. Hume et M. Rousseau, avec les pieces justificatives (1766).
    • This is a pamphlet containing letters between Hume and Rousseau, published anonymously, translated from English by J.B.A. Suard. The pamphlet was translated back to English in A Concise and Genuine account of the Dispute between Mr. Hume and Mr. Rousseau: with the Letters that Passed Between them during their Controversy (1766).
  • Advertisement to Baron Manstein’s Memoirs of Russia, Historical, Political and Military, from MDCXXVII, to MDCXLIV (1770).
    • This is an opening advertisement by Hume to Manstein’s work.
  • The Life of David Hume, Esq. Written by Himself (1777). This contains “My Own Life” and “Letter from Adam Smith, LL.D. to William Strahan, Esq.”
  • Dialogues Concerning Natural religion. By David Hume, Esq. (1779).
    • This is a posthumous edition from Hume’s unpublished manuscript, and contains his most detailed attack on natural religion.
  • Essays on Suicide, and the Immortality of the Soul,  ascribed to the late David Hume, Esq. Never before Published. With  Remarks, intended as an Antidote to the Poison contained in these  Performances, by the Editor. To which is added, Two Letters on Suicide,  from Rosseau’s [sic] Eloisa (1783).
    • This is an unauthorized publication of the two essays that were originally associated with Four Dissertations.

c. Biographies, Letters, Manuscripts

  • Greig, J.Y.T. Letters of David Hume (1932), two volumes.
    • This is the best collection of Hume’s letters (along with the supplementary volume by Klibansky below).
  • Greig, J.Y.T.; Beynon, Harold, eds. “Calendar of Hume MSS. in the possession of the Royal Society,” in Proceedings of the Royal Society of Edinburgh, 1931–1932, Vol. 52, pp. 1–138.
    • This is a detailed list of the Hume manuscripts with a contents summary of each item, and has been published separately in book.
  • Klibansky, Raymond; Mossner, Ernest. New Letters of David Hume (1954).
    • This volume of letters is a supplement to Greig’s two volume collection above.
  • Mossner, E.C.  The Life of David Hume (Oxford, 1980).
    • This is the best biography of Hume.
  • National Library of Scotland (MS no. 23151–23163).
    • This manuscript deposit contains thirteen large volumes assembled from papers collected by Hume’s family after his death. It includes around 150 letters by Hume, 525 letters to him, and several manuscripts of published and unpublished works, most importantly the manuscript of his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion.

d. Bibliographies

  • “The Hume Literature,” Hume Studies, 1977-present.
    • Each year Hume Studies publishes an annual bibliographical update; these bibliographies exclude articles that appear in Hume Studies itself.
  • “An Index of Hume Studies: 1975-1993.” Hume Studies 19.2 (1993).
    • This is a bibliographical index of articles that have appeared in Hume Studies since the journal’s inception until 1993.
  • Fieser, James. A Bibliography of Hume’s Writings and Early Responses (2005).
    • This is a bibliography of Hume’s writings and eighteenth and nineteenth-century responses. It is freely available on the internet.
  • Hall, Rolland. Fifty Years of Hume Scholarship: A Bibliographic Guide (1978).
    • This bibliography covers from 1925 through 1976, and is continued by the annual Hume bibliographies in Hume Studies.
  • Jessop, Thomas Edmund. A bibliography of David Hume and of Scottish philosophy from Francis Hutcheson to Lord Balfour (1938).
    • This is the first published scholarly bibliographical work on Hume, early responses to Hume, and other Scottish philosophers.
  • Tweyman, Stanley. Secondary Sources on the Philosophy of David Hume: A David Hume Bibliography in Two Volumes, 1741-2005 (2006).

e. Works on Hume

The secondary literature on Hume is voluminous. Below are a few works that cover all aspects of Hume’s philosophy. For works on specific aspects of Hume, such as his epistemology, see other IEP articles on Hume.

  • Ayer, A.J. Hume (1980).
    • This is a short but informative introduction by a great twentieth-century philosopher who sees himself as following in the Humean tradition.
  • Blackburn, Simon. How to Read Hume (2008).
    • This is a concise work on various aspects of Hume’s philosophy.
  • Fieser, James. Early Responses to Hume’s Writings (London: Continuum, 2005), 10 volumes.
    • This contains the principal eighteenth and nineteenth-century criticisms of Hume.
  • Kemp Smith, Norman. The Philosophy of David Hume (1941).
    • This groundbreaking book set a new direction for Hume scholarship.
  • Hume Studies, 1977-present.
    • This journal is devoted to Hume scholarship, and most of the volumes are freely accessible on the Hume Studies web site.
  • Jones, Peter, ed. The Reception of David Hume in Europe. London, New York: Thoemmes Continuum, 2005.
    • This work contains chapters by different writers on Hume’s impact in different European countries.
  • Norton, David Fate; Taylor, Jacqueline. The Cambridge Companion to Hume (2008).
    • This contains essays by different writers on various aspects of Hume’s philosophy.
  • Stroud, Barry. Hume (1981).
    • This is an influential analytic discussion of various problems that arise within Hume’s philosophy.

Author Information

James Fieser
University of Tennessee at Martin
U. S. A.

David Hume: Causation

HumeDavid Hume (1711-1776) is one of the British Empiricists of the Early Modern period, along with John Locke and George Berkeley. Although the three advocate similar empirical standards for knowledge,  that is, that there are no innate ideas and that all knowledge comes from experience, Hume is known for applying this standard rigorously to causation and necessity. Instead of taking the notion of causation for granted, Hume challenges us to consider what experience allows us to know about cause and effect.

Hume shows that experience does not tell us much. Of two events, A and B, we say that A causes B when the two always occur together, that is, are constantly conjoined. Whenever we find A, we also find B, and we have a certainty that this conjunction will continue to happen. Once we realize that “A must bring about B” is tantamount merely to “Due to their constant conjunction, we are psychologically certain that B will follow A”, then we are left with a very weak notion of necessity. This tenuous grasp on causal efficacy helps give rise to the Problem of Induction--that we are not reasonably justified in making any inductive inference about the world. Among Hume scholars it is a matter of debate how seriously Hume means us to take this conclusion and whether causation consists wholly in constant conjunction.

This article examines the empirical foundations that lead Hume to his account of causation before detailing his definitions of causation and how he uses these key insights to generate the Problem of Induction. After explicating these two main components of Hume’s notion of causation, three families of interpretation will be explored: the causal reductionist, who takes Hume’s definitions of causation as definitive; the causal skeptic, who takes Hume’s problem of induction as unsolved; and the causal realist, who introduces additional interpretive tools to avoid these conclusions and maintains that Hume has some robust notion of causation.

Table of Contents

  1. Causation's Place in Hume's Taxonomy
  2. Necessary Connections and Hume's Two Definitions
  3. The Problem of Induction
  4. Causal Reductionism
  5. Causal Skepticism
  6. Causal Realism
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. A Note on Hume's Works
    2. Hume's Works on Causation
    3. Works in the History of Philosophy
    4. Contemporary Metaphysics of Causation

1. Causation's Place in Hume's Taxonomy

Hume’s most important contributions to the philosophy of causation are found in A Treatise of Human Nature, and An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, the latter generally viewed as a partial recasting of the former. Both works start with Hume’s central empirical axiom known as the Copy Principle. Loosely, it states that all constituents of our thoughts come from experience. By learning Hume’s vocabulary, this can be restated more precisely. Hume calls the contents of the mind perceptions, which he divides into impressions and ideas. Though Hume himself is not strict about maintaining a concise distinction between the two, we may think of impressions as having their genesis in the senses, whereas ideas are products of the intellect. Impressions, which are either of sensation or reflection (memory), are more vivid than ideas. Hume’s Copy Principle therefore states that all our ideas are products of impressions.

At first glance, the Copy Principle may seem too rigid. To use Hume’s example, we can have an idea of a golden mountain without ever having seen one. But to proffer such examples as counter to the Copy Principle is to ignore the activities of the mind. The mind may combine ideas by relating them in certain ways. If we have the idea of gold and the idea of a mountain, we can combine them to arrive at the idea of a golden mountain. The Copy Principle only demands that, at bottom, the simplest constituent ideas that we relate come from impressions. This means that any complex idea can eventually be traced back to genesis constituent impressions.

In the Treatise, Hume identifies two ways that the mind associates ideas, via natural relations and via philosophical relations. Natural relations have a connecting principle such that the imagination naturally leads us from one idea to another. The three natural relations are resemblance, contiguity, and cause and effect. Of these, Hume tells us that causation is the most prevalent. But cause and effect is also one of the philosophical relations, where the relata have no connecting principle, instead being artificially juxtaposed by the mind. Of the philosophical relations, some, such as resemblance and contrariety, can give us certitude. Some cannot. Cause and effect is one of the three philosophical relations that afford us less than certain knowledge, the other two being identity and situation. But of these, causation is crucial. It alone allows us to go beyond what is immediately present to the senses and, along with perception and memory, is responsible for all our knowledge of the world. Hume therefore recognizes cause and effect as both a philosophical relation and a natural relation, at least in the Treatise, the only work where he draws this distinction.

The relation of cause and effect is pivotal in reasoning, which Hume defines as the discovery of relations between objects of comparison. But note that when Hume says “objects”, at least in the context of reasoning, he is referring to the objects of the mind, that is, ideas and impressions, since Hume adheres to the Early Modern “way of ideas”, the belief that sensation is a mental event and therefore all objects of perception are mental. But causation itself must be a relation rather than a quality of an object, as there is no one property common to all causes or to all effects. By so placing causation within Hume’s system, we arrive at a first approximation of cause and effect. Causation is a relation between objects that we employ in our reasoning in order to yield less than demonstrative knowledge of the world beyond our immediate impressions. However, this is only the beginning of Hume’s insight.

2. Necessary Connections and Hume's Two Definitions

In both the Treatise and the Enquiry, we find Hume’s Fork, his bifurcation of all possible objects of knowledge into relations of ideas and matters of fact. Hume gives several differentiae distinguishing the two, but the principal distinction is that the denial of a true relation of ideas implies a contradiction. Relations of ideas can also be known independently of experience. Matters of fact, however, can be denied coherently, and they cannot be known independently of experience. Although Immanuel Kant later seems to miss this point, arguing for a middle ground that he thinks Hume missed, the two categories must be exclusive and exhaustive. A true statement must be one or the other, but not both, since its negation must either imply a contradiction or not. There is no middle ground. Yet given these definitions, it seems clear that reasoning concerning causation always invokes matters of fact. For Hume, the denial of a statement whose truth condition is grounded in causality is not inconceivable (and hence, not impossible; Hume holds that conceivability implies possibility). For instance, a horror movie may show the conceivability of decapitation not causing the cessation of animation in a human body. But if the denial of a causal statement is still conceivable, then its truth must be a matter of fact, and must therefore be in some way dependent upon experience. Though for Hume, this is true by definition for all matters of fact, he also appeals to our own experience to convey the point. Hume challenges us to consider any one event and meditate on it; for instance, a billiard ball striking another. He holds that no matter how clever we are, the only way we can infer if and how the second billiard ball will move is via past experience. There is nothing in the cause that will ever imply the effect in an experiential vacuum. And here it is important to remember that, in addition to cause and effect, the mind naturally associates ideas via resemblance and contiguity. Hume does not hold that, having never seen a game of billiards before, we cannot know what the effect of the collision will be. Rather, we can use resemblance, for instance, to infer an analogous case from our past experiences of transferred momentum, deflection, and so forth. We are still relying on previous impressions to predict the effect and therefore do not violate the Copy Principle. We simply use resemblance to form an analogous prediction. And we can charitably make such resemblances as broad as we want. Thus, objections like: Under a Humean account, the toddler who burned his hand would not fear the flame after only one such occurrence because he has not experienced a constant conjunction, are unfair to Hume, as the toddler would have had thousands of experiences of the principle that like causes like, and could thus employ resemblance to reach the conclusion to fear the flame.

If Hume is right that our awareness of causation (or power, force, efficacy, necessity, and so forth - he holds all such terms to be equivalent) is a product of experience, we must ask what this awareness consists in. What is meant when some event is judged as cause and effect?  Strictly speaking, for Hume, our only external impression of causation is a mere constant conjunction of phenomena, that B always follows A, and Hume sometimes seems to imply that this is all that causation amounts to. (And this notion of causation as constant conjunction is required for Hume to generate the Problem of induction discussed below.)  Nevertheless, ‘causation’ carries a stronger connotation than this, for constant conjunction can be accidental and therefore doesn’t get us the necessary connection that gives the relation of cause and effect its predictive ability. We may therefore now say that, on Hume’s account, to invoke causality is to invoke a constant conjunction of relata whose conjunction carries with it a necessary connection.

Hume points out that this second component of causation is far from clear. What is this necessity that is implied by causation?  Clearly it is not a logical modality, as there are possible worlds in which the standard laws of causation do not obtain. It might be tempting to state that the necessity involved in causation is therefore a physical or metaphysical necessity. However, Hume considers such elucidations unhelpful, as they tell us nothing about the original impressions involved. At best, they merely amount to the assertion that causation follows causal laws. But invoking this common type of necessity is trivial or circular when it is this very efficacy that Hume is attempting to discover.

We must therefore follow a different route in considering what our impression of necessity amounts to. As causation, at base, involves only matters of fact, Hume once again challenges us to consider what we can know of the constituent impressions of causation. Once more, all we can come up with is an experienced constant conjunction. Of the common understanding of causality, Hume points out that we never have an impression of efficacy. Because of this, our notion of causal law seems to be a mere presentiment that the constant conjunction will continue to be constant, some certainty that this mysterious union will persist. Hume argues that we cannot conceive of any other connection between cause and effect, because there simply is no other impression to which our idea may be traced. This certitude is all that remains.

For Hume, the necessary connection invoked by causation is nothing more than this certainty. Hume’s Copy Principle demands that an idea must have come from an impression, but we have no impression of efficacy in the event itself. Instead, the impression of efficacy is one produced in the mind. As we experience enough cases of a particular constant conjunction, our minds begin to pass a natural determination from cause to effect, adding a little more “oomph” to the prediction of the effect every time, a growing certitude that the effect will follow again. It is the internal impression of this “oomph” that gives rise to our idea of necessity, the mere feeling of certainty that the conjunction will stay constant. Ergo, the idea of necessity that supplements constant conjunction is a psychological projection. We cannot help but think that the event will unfurl in this way.

Having approached Hume’s account of causality by this route, we are now in a position to see the where Hume’s two definitions of causation given in the Treatise come from. (He gives similar but not identical definitions in the Enquiry.) He defines “cause” in the following two ways:

(D1)      An object precedent and contiguous to another, and where all the objects resembling the former are placed in like relations of precedency and contiguity to those objects that resemble the latter.

(D2)      An object precedent and contiguous to another, and so united with it, that the idea of the one determined the mind to form the idea of the other, and the impression of the one to form a more lively idea of the other. (T; SBN 170)

There are reams of literature addressing whether these two definitions are the same and, if not, to which of them Hume gives primacy. J.A. Robinson is perhaps the staunchest proponent of the position that the two are nonequivalent, arguing that there is an nonequivalence in meaning and that they fail to capture the same extension. Two objects can be constantly conjoined without our mind determining that one causes the other, and it seems possible that we can be determined that one object causes another without their being constantly conjoined. But if the definitions fail in this way, then it is problematic that Hume maintains that both are adequate definitions of causation. Some scholars have argued for ways of squaring the two definitions (Don Garrett, for instance, argues that the two are equivalent if they are both read objectively or both read subjectively), while others have given reason to think that seeking to fit or eliminate definitions may be a misguided project.

One alternative to fitting the definitions lies in the possibility that they are doing two separate things, and it might therefore be inappropriate to reduce one to the other or claim that one is more significant than the other. There are several interpretations that allow us to meaningfully maintain the distinction (and therefore the nonequivalence) between the two definitions unproblematically. For instance, D1 can be seen as tracing the external impressions (that is, the constant conjunction) requisite for our idea of causation while D2 traces the internal impressions, both of which are important to Hume in providing a complete account. As Hume says, the definitions are “presenting a different view of the same object.” (T; SBN 170)  Supporting this, Harold Noonan holds that D1 is “what is going on in the world” and that D2 is “what goes on in the mind of the observer” and therefore, “the problem of nonequivalent definitions poses no real problem for understanding Hume.” (Noonan 1999: 150-151)  Simon Blackburn provides a similar interpretation that the definitions are doing two different things, externally and internally. However, Blackburn has the first as giving the “contribution of the world” and the latter giving the “functional difference in the mind that apprehends the regularity.” (Blackburn 2007: 107)  However, this is not the only way to grant an nonequivalence without establishing the primacy of one over the other.

Another method is to cash out the two definitions in terms of the types of relation. Some scholars have emphasized that, according to Hume’s claim in the Treatise, D1 is defining the philosophical relation of cause and effect while D2 defines the natural relation. Walter Ott argues that, if this is right, then the lack of equivalence is not a problem, as philosophical and natural relations would not be expected to capture the same extension. (Ott 2009: 239)  This way of dismissing the nonequivalence of the two definitions becomes more problematic, however, when we realize that Hume does not make the distinction between natural and philosophical relations in the Enquiry, yet provides approximately the same two definitions. If the definitions were meant to separately track the philosophical and natural relations, we might expect Hume to have explained that distinction in the Enquiry rather than dropping it while still maintaining two definitions. Perhaps for this reason, Jonathan Bennett suggests that it is best to forget Hume’s comment of this correspondence. (Bennett 1971: 398)

Though this treatment of literature considering the definitions as meaningfully nonequivalent has been brief, it does serve to show that the definitions need not be forced together. In fact, later in the Treatise, Hume states that necessity is defined by both, either as the constant conjunction or as the mental inference, that they are two different senses of necessity, and Hume, at various points, identifies both as the essence of connection or power. Whether or not Robinson is right in thinking Hume is mistaken in holding this position, Hume himself does not seem to believe one definition is superior to the other, or that they are nonequivalent.

Beyond Hume’s own usage, there is a second worry lingering. Attempting to establish primacy between the definitions implies that they are somehow the bottom line for Hume on causation. But Hume is at pains to point out that the definitions are inadequate. In discussing the “narrow limits of human reason and capacity,” Hume asks,

And what stronger instance can be produced of the surprizing ignorance and weakness of the understanding than [the analysis of causation]? imperfect are the ideas we form concerning it, that it is impossible to give any just definition of cause, except what is drawn from something extraneous and foreign to it….But though both these definitions be drawn from circumstances foreign to cause, we cannot remedy this inconvenience, or attain any more perfect definition…. (EHU 7.29; SBN 77, emphasis his)

The tone this passage conveys is one of resigned dissatisfaction. Although Hume does the best that can be expected on the subject, he is dissatisfied, but this dissatisfaction is inevitable. This is because, as Hume maintains in Part VII of the Enquiry, a definiens is nothing but an enumeration of the constituent simple ideas in the definiendum. However, Hume has just given us reason to think that we have no such satisfactory constituent ideas, hence the “inconvenience” requiring us to appeal to the “extraneous.”  This is not to say that the definitions are incorrect. Note that he still applies the appellation “just” to them despite their appeal to the extraneous, and in the Treatise, he calls them “precise.”  Rather, they are unsatisfying. It is an inconvenience that they appeal to something foreign, something we should like to remedy. Unfortunately, such a remedy is impossible, so the definitions, while as precise as they can be, still leave us wanting something further. But if this is right, then Hume should be able to endorse both D1 and D2 as vital components of causation without implying that he endorses either (or both) as necessary and sufficient for causation. For these reasons, Hume’s discussion leading up to the two definitions should be taken as primary in his account of causation rather than the definitions themselves.

3. The Problem of Induction

The second of Hume’s influential causal arguments is known as the problem of induction, a skeptical argument that utilizes Hume’s insights about experience limiting our causal knowledge to constant conjunction. Though Hume gives a quick version of the Problem in the middle of his discussion of causation in the Treatise (T 1.3.6), it is laid out most clearly in Section IV of the Enquiry. An influential argument, the Problem’s skeptical conclusions have had a drastic impact on the field of epistemology. It should be noted, however, that not everyone agrees about what exactly the Problem consists in. Briefly, the typified version of the Problem as arguing for inductive skepticism can be described as follows:

Recall that proper reasoning involves only relations of ideas and matters of fact. Again, the key differentia distinguishing the two categories of knowledge is that asserting the negation of a true relation of ideas is to assert a contradiction, but this is not the case with genuine matters of fact. But in Section IV, Hume only pursues the justification for matters of fact, of which there are two categories:

(A)           Reports of direct experience, both past and present

(B)           Claims about states of affairs not directly observed

Matters of fact of category (A) would include sensory experience and memory, against which Hume never raises doubts, contra René Descartes. For Hume, (B) would include both predictions and the laws of nature upon which predictions rest. We cannot claim direct experience of predictions or of general laws, but knowledge of them must still be classified as matters of fact, since both they and their negations remain conceivable. In considering the foundations for predictions, however, we must remember that, for Hume, only the relation of cause and effect gives us predictive power, as it alone allows us to go beyond memory and the senses. All such predictions must therefore involve causality and must therefore be of category (B). But what justifies them?

It seems to be the laws governing cause and effect that provide support for predictions, as human reason tries to reduce particular natural phenomena “…to a greater simplicity, and to resolve the many particular effects into a few general causes….” (EHU 4.12; SBN 30)  But this simply sets back the question, for we must now wonder what justifies these “general causes.”  One possible answer is that they are justified a priori as relations of ideas. Hume rejects this solution for two reasons:  First, as shown above, we cannot meditate purely on the idea of a cause and deduce the corresponding effect and, more importantly, to assert the negation of any causal law is not to assert a contradiction.

Here we should pause to note that the generation of the Problem of Induction seems to essentially involve Hume’s insights about necessary connection (and hence our treating it first). Since the Problem of Induction demands that causal connections cannot be known a priori, and that our access is only to constant conjunction, the Problem seems to require the most crucial components of his account of necessity. It is therefore an oddity that, in the Enquiry, Hume waits until Section VII to explicate an account of necessity already utilized in the Problem of Section IV. In the Treatise, however, a version of the Problem appears after Hume’s insights about experience limiting causation to constant conjunction but before the explication of the projectivist necessity and his presenting of the two definitions. It is therefore not entirely clear how Hume views the relationship between his account of necessity and the Problem. Stathis Psillos, for instance, views Hume’s inductive skepticism as a corollary to his account of necessary connection. (Psillos 2002: 31)  However, Peter Millican rightly points out that the Problem can still be construed so as to challenge most non-reductive causal theories as well. (Millican 2002: 141)  Kenneth Clatterbaugh goes further, arguing that Hume’s reductive account of causation and the skepticism the Problem raises can be parsed out so they are entirely separable. (Clatterbaugh 1999: 186)  D.M. Armstrong disagrees, arguing that “…if laws of nature are nothing but Humean uniformities, then inductive scepticism is inevitable.” (Armstrong 1999: 52)

Whether the Problem of induction is in fact separable from Hume’s account of necessary connection, he himself connects the two by arguing that “…the knowledge of this relation is not, in any instance, attained by reasonings a priori; but arises entirely from experience, when we find that any particular objects are constantly conjoined with each other.” (EHU 4.6; SBN 27)  Here, Hume invokes the account of causation explicated above to show that the necessity supporting (B) is grounded in our observation of constant conjunction. This is to say that (B) is grounded in (A). But again, (A) by itself gives us no predictive power. We have thus merely pushed the question back one more step and must now ask with Hume, “What is the foundation of all conclusions from experience?” (EHU 4.14; SBN 32, emphasis his)

The answer to this question seems to be inductive reasoning. We use direct observation to draw conclusions about unobserved states of affairs. But this is just to once more assert that (B) is grounded in (A). The more interesting question therefore becomes how we do this. What lets us reason from (A) to (B)?  The only apparent answer is the assumption of some version of the Principle of the Uniformity of Nature (PUN), the doctrine that nature is always uniform, so unobserved instances of phenomena will resemble the observed. This is called an assumption since we have not, as yet, established that we are justified in holding such a principle. Once more, it cannot be known a priori, as we assert no contradiction by maintaining its falsity. A sporadic, random universe is perfectly conceivable. Therefore, knowledge of the PUN must be a matter of fact. But the principle is predictive and not directly observed. This means that the PUN is an instance of (B), but we were invoking the PUN as the grounds for moving from beliefs of type (A) to beliefs of type (B), thus creating a vicious circle when attempting to justify type (B) matters of fact. We use knowledge of (B) as a justification for our knowledge of (B). The bottom line for Hume’s Problem of induction seems to be that there is no clear way to rationally justify any causal reasoning (and therefore no inductive inference) whatsoever. We have no ground that allows us to move from (A) to (B), to move beyond sensation and memory, so any matter of fact knowledge beyond these becomes suspect.

Louis Loeb calls this reconstruction of Hume targeting the justification of causal inference-based reasoning the “traditional interpretation” (Loeb 2008: 108), and Hume’s conclusion that causal inferences have “no just foundation” (T; SBN 91) lends support to this interpretation. Under this reconstruction, the epistemic circularity revealed by Hume’s Problem of Induction seems detrimental to knowledge. However, there are philosophers (Max Black, R. B. Braithwaite, Charles Peirce [suggest notably Charles Pierce if author intends emphasis], and Brian Skyrms, for instance) that, while agreeing that Hume targets the justification of inductive inference, insist that this particular justificatory circle is not vicious or that it is unproblematic for various reasons. As discussed below, Hume may be one such philosopher. Alternatively, there are those that think that Hume claims too much in insisting that inductive arguments fail to lend probability to their conclusions. D. C. Stove maintains that, while Hume argues that inductive inference never adds probability to its conclusion, Hume’s premises actually only support “inductive fallibilism”, a much weaker position that induction can never attain certainty (that is, that the inferences are never valid). Hume illicitly adds that no invalid argument can still be reasonable. (Stove 1973: 48)

But not all are in agreement that Hume’s intended target is the justification of causal or inductive inference. Tom Beauchamp and Alexander Rosenberg agree that Hume’s argument implies inductive fallibilism, but hold that this position is adopted intentionally as a critique of the deductivist rationalism of Hume’s time. (Beauchamp and Rosenberg 1981: 44)  Annette Baier defends a similar account, focusing on Hume’s use of “reason” in the argument, which she insists should be used only in the narrow sense of Hume’s “demonstrative sciences”. (Baier 1991: 60)  More recently, Don Garret has argued that Hume’s negative conclusion is one of cognitive psychology, that we do not adopt induction based on doxastically sufficient argumentation. Induction is simply not supported by argument, good or bad. Instead, it is an instinctive mechanism that we share with animals. (Garrett 1997: 92, 94)  Similarly, David Owen holds that Hume’s Problem of induction is not an argument against the reasonableness of inductive inference, but, “Rather Hume is arguing that reason cannot explain how we come to have beliefs in the unobserved on the basis of past experience.” (Owen 1999: 6)  We see that there are a variety of interpretations of Hume’s Problem of induction and, as we will see below, how we interpret the Problem will inform how we interpret his ultimate causal position.

4. Causal Reductionism

Having described these two important components of his account of causation, let us consider how Hume’s position on causation is variously interpreted, starting with causal reductionism. The family of reductionist theories, often read out of Hume’s account of necessity outlined above, maintain that causation, power, necessity, and so forth, as something that exists between external objects rather than in the observer, is constituted entirely by regular succession. In the external world, causation simply is the regularity of constant conjunction. In fact, the defender of this brand of regularity theory of causation is generally labeled a “Humean” about causation. However, since this interpretation, as Hume’s own historical position, remains in contention, the appellation will be avoided here.

Because of the variant opinions of how we should view the relationship between the two definitions proffered by Hume, we find two divergent types of reduction of Humean causation. First, there are reductionists that insist Hume reduces causation to nothing beyond constant conjunction, that is, the reduction is to a simple naïve regularity theory of causation, and therefore the mental projection of D2 plays no part. The motivation for this interpretation seems to be an emphasis on Hume’s D1, either by saying that it is the only definition that Hume genuinely endorses, or that D2 somehow collapses into D1 or that D2 does not represent a genuine ontological reduction, and is therefore not relevant to the metaphysics of causation. Robinson, for instance, claims that D2 is explanatory in nature, and is merely part of an empiricist psychological theory. (Robinson 1962)

This focus on D1 is regarded as deeply problematic by some Hume scholars (Francis Dauer, H.O. Mounce, and Fred Wilson, for instance), because it seems to be an incomplete account of Hume’s discussion of necessary connection presented above. A reductive emphasis on D1 as definitive ignores not only D2 as a definition but also ignores all of the argument leading up to it. This is to disregard the discussion through which Hume accounts for the necessity of causation, a component which he describes as “of much greater importance” than the contiguity and succession of D1. (T; SBN 77)  In short, a reduction to D1 ignores the mental determination component. However, this practice may not be as uncharitable as it appears, as many scholars see the first definition as the only component of his account relevant to metaphysics. For instance, D.M. Armstrong, after describing both components, simply announces his intention to set aside the mental component as irrelevant to the metaphysics of causation. (Armstrong 1983: 4)  J. L. Mackie similarly stresses that, “It is about causation so far as we know about it in objects that Hume has the firmest and most fully argued views,” (Mackie 1980: 21) and it is for this reason that he focuses on D1.

However, not everyone agrees that D2 can or should be dropped so easily from Hume’s system. In addition to its accounting for the necessity of causation mentioned above, recall that Hume makes frequent reference to both definitions as accurate or just, and at one point even refers to D2 as constituting the essence of causation. Therefore, whether or not the projectivism of D2 actually is relevant to the metaphysics of causation, a strong case can be made that Hume thinks it is so, and therefore an accurate historical interpretation needs to include D2 in order to capture Hume’s intentions. (Below, the assumption that Hume is even doing metaphysics will also be challenged.)  The more common Humean reduction, then, adds a projectivist twist by somehow reducing causation to constant conjunction plus the internal impression of necessity. (See, for instance, Beauchamp and Rosenberg 1981: 11, Goodman 1983: 60, Mounce 1999: 42, Noonan 1999: 140-145, Ott 2009: 224 or Wilson 1997: 16)  Of course while this second type of reductionist agrees that the projectivist component should be included, there is less agreement as to how, precisely, it is supposed to fit into Hume’s overall causal picture. Largely for this reason, we have a host of reductionist interpretations rather than a single version. The unifying thread of the reductionist interpretations is that causation, as it exists in the object, is constituted by regularity.

But given the Humean account of causation outlined above, it is not difficult to see how Hume’s writings give rise to such reductionist positions. After all, both D1 and D2 seem reductive in nature. If, as is often the case, we take definitions to represent the necessary and sufficient conditions of the definiendum, then both the definitions are reductive notions of causation. D1 reduces causation to proximity, continuity, and constant conjunction, and D2 similarly reduces causation to proximity, continuity, and the internal mental determination that moves the first object or idea to the second. Even considering Hume’s alternate account of definitions, where a definition is an enumeration of the constituent ideas of the definiendum, this does not change the two definitions’ reductive nature. Given that Hume’s discussions of causation culminate in these two definitions, combined with the fact that the conception of causation they provide is used in Hume’s later philosophical arguments of the Treatise, the definitions play a crucial role in understanding his account of causation. Therefore, the various forms of causal reductionism can constitute reasonable interpretations of Hume. By putting the two definitions at center state, Hume can plausibly be read as emphasizing that our only notion of causation is constant conjunction with certitude that it will continue. Nevertheless, reductionism is not the only way to interpret Hume’s theory of causation.

5. Causal Skepticism

One way to interpret the reasoning behind assigning Hume the position of causal skepticism is by assigning similar import to the passages emphasized by the reductionists, but interpreting the claims epistemically rather than ontologically. In other words, rather than interpreting Hume’s insights about the tenuousness of our idea of causation as representing an ontological reduction of what causation is, Humean causal skepticism can instead be viewed as his clearly demarcating the limits of our knowledge in this area and then tracing out the ramifications of this limiting. (Below, we will see that the causal realists also take Hume’s account of necessity as epistemic rather than ontological.)  If Hume’s account is intended to be epistemic, then the Problem of induction can be seen as taking Hume’s insights about our impressions of necessity to an extreme but reasonable conclusion. If it is true that constant conjunction (with or without the added component of mental determination) represents the totality of the content we can assign to our concept of causation, then we lose any claim to robust metaphysical necessity. But once this is lost, we also sacrifice our only rational grounding of causal inference. Our experience of constant conjunction only provides a projectivist necessity, but a projectivist necessity does not provide any obvious form of accurate predictive power. Hence, if we limit causation to the content provided by the two definitions, we cannot use this weak necessity to justify the PUN and therefore cannot ground predictions. We are therefore left in a position of inductive skepticism which denies knowledge beyond memory and what is present to the senses. By limiting causation to constant conjunction, we are incapable of grounding causal inference; hence Humean inductive skepticism.

In this way, the causal skeptic interpretation takes the “traditional interpretation” of the Problem of induction seriously and definitively, defending that Hume never solved it. Since we never directly experience power, all causal claims certainly appear susceptible to the Problem of Induction. The attempted justification of causal inference would lead to the vicious regress explained above in lieu of finding a proper grounding. The supporters of Humean causal skepticism can then be seen as ascribing to him what seems to be a reasonable position,  which is, the conclusion that we have no knowledge of such causal claims, as they would necessarily lack proper justification. The family of interpretations that have Hume’s ultimate position as that of a causal skeptic therefore maintain that we have no knowledge of inductive causal claims, as they would necessarily lack proper justification. We can never claim knowledge of category (B)  D. M. Armstrong reads Hume this way, seeing Hume’s reductivist account of necessity and its implications for laws of nature as ultimately leading him to skepticism. (Armstrong 1983: 53)  Other Hume scholars that defend a skeptical interpretation of causation include Martin Bell, (Rupert and Richman 2007: 129) and Michael Levine, who maintains that Hume’s causal skepticism ultimately undermines his own Enquiry argument against miracles.

There are, however, some difficulties with this interpretation. First, it relies on assigning the “traditional interpretation” to the Problem of induction though, as discussed above, this is not the only account. Secondly, reading the conclusion of the Problem of Induction in this way is difficult to square with the rest of Hume’s corpus. For instance, the Copy Principle, fundamental to his work, has causal implications, and Hume relies on inductive inference as early as T; SBN 4. Hume consistently relies on analogical reasoning in the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion even after Philo grants that the necessity of causation is provided by custom, and the experimental method used to support the “science of man” so vital to Hume’s Treatise clearly demands the reliability of causal inference. Hume’s causal skepticism would therefore seem to undermine his own philosophy. Of course, if this is the correct way to read the Problem of Induction, then so much the worse for Hume.

A more serious challenge for the skeptical interpretation of Hume is that it ignores the proceeding Part of the Enquiry, in which Hume immediately provides what he calls a “solution” to the Problem of Induction. Hume states that, even though they are not supported by reason, causal inferences are “essential to the subsistence of all creatures,” and that:

It is more comfortable to the ordinary wisdom of nature to secure so necessary an act of the mind, by some instinct or mechanical tendency, which may be infallible in its operations, may discover itself at the first appearance of life and thought, and may be independent of all the laboured deductions of the understanding. As nature has taught us the use of our limbs, without giving us the knowledge of the muscles and nerves by which they are actuated; so she has implanted in us an instinct, which carries forward the thought in a correspondent course to that which she has established among external objects; though we are ignorant of those powers and forces, on which this course and succession of objects totally depends. (EHU 5.22; SBN 55)

Here, Hume seems to have causal inference supported by instinct rather than reason. The causal skeptic will interpret this as descriptive rather than normative, but others are not so sure. It is not clear that Hume views this instinctual tendency as doxastically inappropriate in any way. Therefore, another interpretation of this “solution” is that Hume thinks we can be justified in making causal inferences. However, it is not reason that justifies us, but rather instinct (and reason, in fact, is a subspecies of instinct for Hume, implying that at least some instinctual faculties are fit for doxastic assent). This will be discussed more fully below.

6. Causal Realism

Against the positions of causal reductionism and causal skepticism is the New Hume tradition. It started with Norman Kemp Smith’s The Philosophy of David Hume, and defends the view that Hume is a causal realist, a position that entails the denial of both causal reductionism and causal skepticism by maintaining that the truth value of causal statements is not reducible to non-causal states of affairs and that they are in principle, knowable. (Tooley 1987: 246-47)  The case for Humean causal realism is the least intuitive, given the explications above, and will therefore require the most explanation. However, the position can be rendered more plausible with the introduction of three interpretive tools whose proper utilization seems required for making a convincing realist interpretation. Of these, two are distinctions which realist interpretations insist that Hume respects in a crucial way but that non-realist interpretations often deny. The last is some mechanism by which to overcome the skeptical challenges Hume himself raises.

The first distinction is between ontological and epistemic causal claims. Strawson points out that we can distinguish:

(O)  Causation as it is in the objects, and

(E)  Causation so far as we know about it in the objects.

He maintains, “…Hume’s Regularity theory of causation is only a theory about (E), not about (O).” (Strawson 1989: 10)  Whether or not we agree that Hume limits his theory to the latter, the distinction itself is not difficult to grasp. It simply separates what we can know from what is the case. The realist interpretation then applies this to Hume’s account of necessary connection, holding that it is not Hume’s telling us what causation is, but only what we can know of it. Hume’s account is then merely epistemic and not intended to have decisive ontological implications. This undercuts the reductionist interpretation. Simply because Hume says that this is what we can know of causation, it does not follow that Hume therefore believes that this is all that causation amounts to. In fact, such an interpretation might better explain Hume’s dissatisfaction over the definitions. If Hume were a reductionist, then the definitions should be correct or complete and there would not be the reservations discussed above.

Further, given Hume’s skeptical attitude toward speculative metaphysics, it seems unlikely that he would commit the Epistemic Fallacy and allow the inference from “x is all we can know of y” to “x constitutes the real, mind-independent essence of y,”  as some (though not all) reductionist accounts would require. In fact, Hume must reject this inference, since he does not believe a resemblance thesis between perceptions and external objects can ever be philosophically established. He makes this denial explicit in Part XII of the Enquiry.

The epistemic interpretation of the distinction can be made more compelling by remembering what Hume is up to in the third Part of Book One of the Treatise. Here, as in many other areas of his writings, he is doing his standard empiricist investigation. Since we have some notion of causation, necessary connection, and so forth, his Copy Principle demands that this idea must be traceable to impressions. Hume’s account of causation should therefore be viewed an attempt to trace these genesis impressions and to thereby reveal the true content of the idea they comprise. Thus, it is the idea of causation that interests Hume. In fact, the title of Section 1.3.2 is “Of probability; and of the idea of cause and effect”. He announces, “To begin regularly, we must consider the idea of causation, and see from what origin it is deriv’d.” (T; SBN 74, his emphasis )  Hume therefore seems to be doing epistemology rather than metaphysics. (Mounce 1999: 32 takes this as indicative of a purely epistemic project.)

Although this employment of the distinction may proffer a potential reply to the causal reductionist, there is still a difficulty lurking. While it may be true that Hume is trying to explicate the content of the idea of causation by tracing its constituent impressions, this does not guarantee that there is a coherent idea, especially when Hume makes occasional claims that we have no idea of power, and so forth. The challenge seems to amount to this:  Even if the previous distinction is correct, and Hume is talking about what we can know but not necessarily what is, the causal realist holds that substantive causal connections exist beyond constant conjunction. This is to posit a far stronger claim than merely having an idea of causation. The realist Hume says that there is causation beyond constant conjunction, thereby attributing him a positive ontological commitment, whereas his own skeptical arguments against speculative metaphysics rejecting parity between ideas and objects should, at best, only imply agnosticism about the existence of robust causal powers. (It is for this reason that Martin Bell and Paul Russell reject the realist interpretation.)  There therefore seems to be a tension between accepting Hume’s account of necessary connection as purely epistemic and attributing to Hume the existence of an entity beyond what we can know by investigating our impressions.

Put another way, Hume’s Copy Principle requires that our ideas derive their content from constitutive impressions. However, if the previous distinction is correct, then Hume has already exhaustively explicated the impressions that give content to our idea of causation.  This is the very same content that leads to the two definitions. It seems that Hume has to commit himself to the position that there is no clear idea of causation beyond the proffered reduction. But if this is true, and Hume is not a reductionist, what is he positing?  It is here that the causal realist will appeal to the other two interpretive tools, viz. a second distinction and a belief mechanism, the former allowing us to make sense of the positive claim and the latter providing justification for it.

The realists claim that the second distinction is explicit in Hume’s writing. This is the distinction between “conceiving” or “imagining” and merely “supposing”. The general proposal is that we can and do have two different levels of clarity when contemplating a particular notion. We can either have a Cartesian clear and distinct idea, or we can have a supposition, that is, a vague, incomplete, or “relative” notion. The suggestion is this:  Simple ideas are clear and distinct (though not as vivid as their corresponding impressions) and can be combined via the various relations. Groups compiled by relating these simple ideas form mental objects. In some cases, they combine in a coherent way, forming clear and distinct complex ideas, while in other cases, the fit is not so great, either because we do not see how the constituent ideas relate, or there is something missing from our conception. These suppositions do not attain the status of complex ideas in and of themselves, and remain an amalgamation of simple ideas that lack unity. The claim would then be that we can conceive distinct ideas, but only suppose incomplete notions.

Something like this distinction has historical precedence. In the Fifth Replies, Descartes distinguishes between some form of understanding and a complete conception. Berkeley also distinguishes between an “idea” and a mere “notion” in the third Dialogue and the second edition of the Principles. Perhaps most telling, Locke uses terminology identical to Hume’s in regard to substance, claiming we have “…no other idea of it at all, but only a Supposition….” (Essay, II.xxiii.2, emphasis his)  Such a supposition is “an obscure and relative Idea.” (Essay, II.xxiii.3)

The realist employment of this second distinction is two-fold. First, the realist interpretation will hold that claims in which Hume states that we have no idea of power, and so forth, are claims about conceiving of causation. They only claim that we have no clear and distinct idea of power, or that what is clearly and distinctly conceived is merely constant conjunction. But a more robust account of causation is not automatically ruled out simply because our notion is not distinct. In this way, the distinction may blunt the passages where Hume seems pessimistic about the content of our idea of causation.

The second step of the causal realist interpretation will be to then insist that we can at least suppose (in the technical sense) a genuine cause, even if the notion is opaque, that is, to insist that mere suppositions are fit for doxastic assent. There doesn’t seem to be anything terribly problematic in believing in something of which we have an unclear representation. To return to the Fifth Replies, Descartes holds that we can believe in the existence and coherence of an infinite being with such vague ideas, implying that a clear and distinct idea is not necessary for belief. Hume denies clear and distinct content beyond constant conjunction, but it is not obvious that he denies all content beyond constant conjunction.

This second distinction is not introduced without controversy. Briefly, against the distinction, Kenneth Winkler offers an alternative suggestion that Hume’s talk of secret connections is actually a reference to further regularities that are simply beyond current human observation (such as the microscopic or subatomic), while ultimately interpreting Hume as an agnostic about robust causation. (Winkler 1991: 552-556)  John Wright argues that this is to ignore Hume’s reasons for his professed ignorance in the hidden, that is, our inability to make causal inferences a priori. (Wright 1983: 92)  Alternatively, Blackburn, a self-proclaimed “quasi-realist”, argues that the terminology of the distinction is too infrequent to bear the philosophical weight that the realist reading would require. (Blackburn 2007: 101-102)  P.J.E. Kail resists this by pointing out that Hume’s overall attitude strongly suggests that he “assumes the existence of material objects,” and that Hume clearly employs the distinction and its terminology in at least one place: T; SBN 217-218. (Kail, 2007: 60) There, Hume describes a case in which philosophers develop a notion impossible to clearly and distinctly perceive, that somehow there are properties of objects independent of any perception. We simply cannot conceive such an idea, but it certainly remains possible to entertain or suppose this conjecture. Clatterbaugh takes an even stronger position than Blackburn, positing that for Hume to talk of efficacious secret powers would be literally to talk nonsense, and would force us to disregard Hume’s own epistemic framework, (Clatterbaugh 1999: 204) while Ott similarly argues that the inability to give content to causal terms means Hume cannot meaningfully affirm or deny causation. (Ott 2009: 198)

Even granting that Hume not only acknowledges this second distinction but genuinely believes that we can suppose a metaphysically robust notion of causal necessity, the realist still has this difficulty. How can Hume avoid the anti-realist criticism of Winkler, Ott, and Clatterbaugh that his own epistemic criteria demand that he remain agnostic about causation beyond constant conjunction?  In other words, given the skeptical challenges Hume levels throughout his writings, why think that such a seemingly ardent skeptic would not merely admit the possibility of believing in a supposition, instead of insisting that this is, in fact, the nature of reality?  The realist seems to require some Humean device that would imply that this position is epistemically tenable, that our notion of causation can reasonably go beyond the content identified by the arguments leading to the two definitions of causation and provide a robust notion that can defeat the Problem of Induction.

This is where the realists (and non-realists) seem most divided in their interpretations of Hume. Generally, the appeal is to Hume’s texts suggesting he embraces some sort of non-rational mechanism by which such beliefs are formed and/or justified, such as his purported solution to the Problem of Induction. This picture has been parsed out in terms of doxastic naturalism, transcendental arguments, psychological necessity, instinct, and even some form of proper function. However, what the interpretations all have in common is that humans arrive at certain mediate beliefs via some method quite distinct from the faculty of reason.

Let us now consider the impact that adopting these naturally formed beliefs would have on Hume’s causal theory. The function is two-fold. First, it provides some sort of justification for why it might be plausible for Hume to deem mere suppositions fit for belief. The other role is to answer the skeptical challenges raised by the “traditional interpretation” of the Problem of Induction. It would provide a way to justify causal beliefs despite the fact that said beliefs appear to be without rational grounds. It accomplishes the latter by emphasizing what the argument concludes, namely that inductive reasoning is groundless, that there is no rational basis for inductive inference. As Hume says, “Reason can never show us the connexion of one object with another….” (T; SBN 92, emphasis mine)  In granting such a mechanism, we grant Hume the epistemic propriety of affirming something reason cannot establish. Further, it smoothes over worries about consistency arising from the fact that Hume seemingly undercuts all rational belief in causation, but then merrily shrugs off the Problem and continues to invoke causal reasoning throughout his writings.

In the realist framework outlined above, doxastic naturalism is a necessary component for a consistent realist picture. Kemp Smith argues for something stronger, that this non-rational mechanism itself implies causal realism. After engaging the non-rational belief mechanism responsible for our belief in body, he goes on to argue, “Belief in causal action is, Hume argues, equally natural and indispensable; and he freely recognizes the existence of ‘secret’ causes, acting independently of experience.” (Kemp Smith 2005: 88)  He connects these causal beliefs to the unknown causes that Hume tells us are “original qualities in human nature.” (T; SBN 13)  Kemp Smith therefore holds that Humean doxastic naturalism is sufficient for Humean causal realism. The reductionist, however, will rightly point out that this move is entirely too fast. Even granting that Hume has a non-rational mechanism at work and that we arrive at causal beliefs via this mechanism does not imply that Hume himself believes in robust causal powers, or that it is appropriate to do so. However, combining Humean non-rational justification with the two distinctions mentioned above at least seems to form a consistent alternative to the reductionist and skeptical interpretations. Just which of these three is right, however, remains contentious.

7. References and Further Reading

a. A Note on Hume's Works

Hume wrote all of his philosophical works in English, so there is no concern about the accuracy of English translation. For the casual reader, any edition of his work should be sufficient. However, Oxford University Press produced the definitive Clarendon Edition of most of his works. For the serious scholar, these are a must have, as they contain copious helpful notes about Hume’s changes in editions, and so forth. The general editor of the series is Tom L. Beauchamp.

When referencing Hume’s works, however, there are standard editions of the Treatise and his Enquiries originally edited by L.A. Selby-Bigge and later revised by P.H. Nidditch. Hence, citations will often be given with an SBN page number. But Hume also numerated his own works to varying degrees. The Treatise is divided into three Books, each with Parts, Sections, and paragraphs. Hence, four numbers can give a precise location of a passage. Hume’s two definitions of cause are found at T; SBN 170, that is, in the Treatise, Book One, Part Three, Section Fourteen, paragraph thirty-one. This paragraph can be found on page 170 of the Selby-Bigge Nidditch editions. Hume’s shorter works, such as the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, are not as thoroughly outlined.  Instead, the Enquiry is only divided into Sections, only some of which have Parts. Hence, we also find Hume’s definitions at EHU 7.29; SBN 76-77, or Part Seven of the Enquiry, paragraph twenty-nine, pages 76 and 77 of the Selby-Bigge Nidditch editions.

b. Hume's Works on Causation

  • Hume, David. A Treatise of Human Nature. Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K., 2007, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K., 2000, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp.

c. Works in the History of Philosophy

  • Ayers, Michael. “Natures and Laws from Descartes to Hume”, in The Philosophical Canon in the Seventeenth and Eighteenth Centuries: Essays in Honour of John W. Yolton, edited by G.A.J. Rogers and S. Tomaselli, University of Rochester Press, Rochester, New York, 1996.
    • This article argues that there are two main traditions of efficacy in the Early Modern period, that objects have natures or that they follow laws imposed by God. This bifurcation then informs how Hume argues, as he must engage the former.
  • Baier, Annette C. A Progress of Sentiments- Reflections on Hume’s Treatise. Harvard University Press, Cambridge Massachusetts, 1991.
    • Baier argues for a nuanced reading of the Treatise, that we can only understand it with the addition of the passions, and so forth, of the later Books.
  • Beauchamp, Tom L. and Rosenberg, Alexander. Hume and the Problem of Causation. Oxford University Press, New York, New York, 1981.
    • This is an important but technical explication and defense of the Humean causal reductionist position, both as a historical reading and as a contemporary approach to causation. The authors argue directly against the skeptical position, instead insisting that the Problem of induction targets only Hume’s rationalist predecessors.
  • Beebee, Helen. Hume on Causation. Routledge University Press, New York, New York, 2006.
    • Beebee rejects the standard interpretations of Hume’s causation before proffering her own, which is grounded in human nature and his theory of mind. Her critiques of the standard Humean views are helpful and clear.
  • Bennett, Jonathan. Learning from Six Philosophers. (two volumes)  Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K., 2001.
    • These two volumes constitute a solid introduction to the major figures of the Modern period. Volume One discusses Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, and Volume Two is an updated recasting of his Locke, Berkeley, Hume- Central Themes.
  • Bennett, Jonathan. Locke, Berkeley, Hume- Central Themes. Oxford University Press, Glasgow, U.K., 1971.
    • This is an excellent overview of the main doctrines of the British empiricists.
  • Blackburn, Simon. “Hume and Thick Connexions”, as reprinted in Read, Rupert and Richman, Kenneth A. (Editors). The New Hume Debate (Revised Edition). Routledge, New York, New York, 2007, pages 100-112.
    • This is the second, updated version of an important investigation into the realism/reductionism debate. He ultimately adopts a “quasi-realist” position that is weaker than the realist definition given above.
  • Buckle, Stephen. Hume’s Enlightenment Tract- The Unity and Purpose of An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Clarendon Press, Oxford, Oxford U.K., 2001.
    • This book examines the Enquiry, distancing it from the standard reading of a recasting of the Treatise. Instead, Buckle argues that the work stands alone as a cohesive whole.
  • Clatterbaugh, Kenneth. The Causation Debate in Modern Philosophy, 1637-1739. Routledge, New York, New York, 1999.
    • This book traces the various causal positions of the Early Modern period, both rationalist and empiricist.
  • Costa, Michael J. “Hume and Causal Realism”. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 67: 2, pages 172-190.
    • Costa gives his take on the realism debate by clarifying several notions that are often run together. Like Blackburn, he ultimately defends a view somewhere between reductionism and realism.
  • Craig, Edward. “The Idea of Necessary Connexion” in Reading Hume on Human Understanding, edited by Peter Millican, Oxford University Press, New York, New York, 2002, pages 211-229.
    • This article is an updated and expanded defense of the Hume section of The Mind of God and the Works of Man.
  • Craig, Edward. The Mind of God and the Works of Man. Oxford University Press Clarendon, New York, New York, 1987.
    • A complex book that discusses the works of several philosophers in arguing for its central thesis, Craig’s work is one of the first to defend a causal realist interpretation of Hume.
  • Dauer, Francis Watanabe. “Hume on the Relation of Cause and Effect” in A Companion to Hume, edited by Radcliffe, Elizabeth S, Blackwell Publishing, Ltd, Malden, MA, 2008, pages 89-105.
    • Dauer takes a careful look at the text of the Treatise, followed by a critical discussion of the three most popular interpretations of the two definitions.
  • Fogelin, Robert J. Hume’s Skepticism in the Treatise of Human Nature. Routledge and Kegan Paul, London, U.K., 1985.
  • Garrett, Don. Cognition and Commitment in Hume’s Philosophy. Oxford University Press. New York, New York, 1997.
    • This is a great introduction to some of the central issues of Hume’s work. Garrett surveys the various positions on each of ten contentious issues in Hume scholarship before giving his own take. Among other things, he argues for a novel way to square the two definitions of cause.
  • Howson, Colin. Hume’s Problem: Induction and the Justification of Belief. Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K., 2000.
    • This highly technical text first defends Hume’s skeptical induction against contemporary attempts at refutation, ultimately concluding that the difficulties in justifying induction are inherent. Nevertheless, given certain assumptions, induction becomes viable. He then goes on to provide a reliable Bayesian framework of a limited type.
  • Kail, P.J.E. Projection and Realism in Hume’s Philosophy. Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K., 2007.
    • This book explores the projectivist strand of Hume’s thought, and how it helps clarify Hume’s position within the realism debate, presenting Hume’s causal account as a combination of projectivism and realism.
  • Kemp Smith, Norman. The Philosophy of David Hume. Palgrave MacMillan, New York, New York, 2005.
    • This is the work that started the New Hume debate. Palgrave MacMillan has released it in a new edition with an extended introduction describing the work’s importance and the status of the debate.
  • Livingston, Donald W. “Hume on Ultimate Causation.”  American Philosophical Quarterly, Volume 8, 1971, pages 63-70.
    • This is a concise argument for causal realism, which Livingston later expands into a book. Here, he defends the Humean skeptical realism that he considers necessary for other strands of Hume’s philosophy.
  • Livingston, Donald W. Hume’s Philosophy of Common Life. University of Chicago Press, Chicago, Illinois, 1984.
    • This is one of the standard explications of Humean causal realism. It stresses Hume’s position that philosophy should conform to and explain common beliefs rather than conflict with them.
  • Loeb, Louis E. “Inductive Inference in Hume’s Philosophy”, in A Companion to Hume, edited by Radcliffe, Elizabeth S, Blackwell Publishing, Ltd, Malden, MA, 2008, pages 106-125.
    • This is a contemporary analysis of the Problem of induction that ultimately rejects causal skepticism.
  • Loeb, Louis E. Stability and Justification in Hume’s Treatise, Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K., 2002.
    • This well-argued work offers an interpretation of the Treatise building around Hume’s claim that the mind ultimately seeks stability in its beliefs. Linking justification with “settled beliefs” provides a positive rather than merely destructive epistemology.
  • McCracken, Charles J. Malebranche and British Philosophy. Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K., 1983.
    • Among other things, McCracken shows how much of Hume’s insight into our knowledge of causal necessity can be traced back to the occasionalism of Malebranche.
  • Millican, Peter. “Hume, Causal Realism, and Causal Science”, Mind, Volume 118, Issue 471, July, 2009, pages 647-712.
    • After giving an overview of the recent debate, Millican argues that the New Hume debate should be settled via Hume’s logic, rather than language, and so forth. He largely rejects the realist interpretation, since the reductionist interpretation is required to carry later philosophical arguments that Hume gives.
  • Millican, Peter. “Hume’s Sceptical Doubts concerning Induction”, in Reading Hume on Human Understanding, edited by Peter Millican, Clarendon Press, Oxford, Oxford, U.K. 2002, pages 107-173.
    • This is a somewhat technical reconstruction of the Problem of Induction, as well as an exploration of its place within Hume’s philosophy and its ramifications.
  • Mounce, H.O. Hume’s Naturalism, Routledge, New York, New York, 1999.
    • This book is an extended development of Hume’s doxastic naturalism over his empiricism.
  • Noonan, Harold W. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Hume on Knowledge. Routledge, London, U.K., 1999.
    • Noonan gives an accessible introduction to Hume’s epistemology.
  • Ott, Walter. Causation and Laws of Nature in Early Modern Philosophy. Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K., 2009.
    • This is an advanced survey of causation in the Early Modern period, covering both the rationalists and the empiricists.
  • Owen, David. Hume’s Reason. Oxford University Press, New York, New York, 1999.
    • This book is an extended treatment of Hume’s notion of reason and its impact on many of his important arguments.
  • Robinson, J. A. “Hume’s Two Definitions of ‘Cause’”. The Philosophical Quarterly, Volume 12, 1962.
    • This article is a concise argument for the difficulties inherent to squaring the two definitions.
  • Robinson, J. A. “Hume’s Two Definitions of ‘Cause’ Reconsidered”. The Philosophical Quarterly, Volume 15, 1965, as reprinted in Hume, A Collection of Critical Essays, edited by V. C. Chappell. University of Notre Dame Press, Notre Dame, Indiana, 1966.
    • This is an updated follow-up to his previous article.
  • Read, Rupert and Richman, Kenneth A. (editors). The New Hume Debate- Revised Edition. Routledge, New York, New York, 2007.
    • This compilation presents a balanced collection of the important works on both sides of the causal realism debate.
  • Stove, David. Probability and Hume’s Inductive Skepticism. Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K., 1973.
    • Stove presents a math-heavy critique of Hume’s inductive skepticism by insisting that Hume claims too much. Instead of concluding that inductive inference adds nothing to the probability of a conclusion, his premises only imply inductive fallibilism, that is, that they never attain deductive certainty. While no inductive inference is valid, this does not imply that they cannot be reasonable.
  • Strawson, Galen. The Secret Connexion- Causation, Realism, and David Hume. Oxford University Press Clarendon, New York, New York, 1989.
    • This book is perhaps the most clear and complete explication of the New Hume doctrines.
  • Wilson, Fred. Hume’s Defense of Causal Inference. University of Toronto Press, Toronto Canada, 1997.
    • Wilson’s main goal is to defend an anti-skeptical interpretation of Hume’s causal inference, but the book is wide-ranging and rich in many areas of Hume scholarship.
  • Winkler, Kenneth P. “The New Hume”, The Philosophical Review, Volume 100, Number 4, October 1991, pages 541-579.
    • Winkler presents a clear and concise case against the realist interpretation.
  • Wright, John P. The Sceptical Realism of David Hume. University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, Minnesota, 1983.
    • This book is one of the standard explications of Humean causal realism. The interpretation is arrived at via a focus on Hume’s attention to human nature. The book also places Hume’s notion of knowledge within its historical context.

d. Contemporary Metaphysics of Causation

  • Armstrong, D. M. What is a Law of Nature? Cambridge University Press, New York, New York, 1983.
    • This book investigates the status of the laws of nature. He ultimately argues that laws are relations between universals or properties.
  • Goodman, Nelson. Fact, Fiction, and Forecast. Fourth Edition, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts, 1983.
    • Goodman explicates the Problem of induction and makes a more general form of the difficulty it raises.
  • Mackie, J. L. The Cement of the Universe- A Study of Causation. Oxford University Press Clarendon, New York, New York, 1980.
    • This work begins with Hume’s analysis of causation and then goes on to consider what we can know about causation as it exists in external objects. Though it is highly technical, it touches many issues important to contemporary metaphysics of causation.
  • Psillos, Stathis. Causation and Explanation. MCGill-Queen’s University Press, Montreal, Canada, 2002.
    • This book is an accessible survey of contemporary causality, linking many of the important issues and engaging the relevant literature.
  • Tooley, Michael. Causation–A Realist Approach. Clarendon Press, Oxford, U.K., 1987.
    • Tooley presents a contemporary defense of realism with efficacy as relations among universals. In doing so, he clarifies many notions and commitments of the various realist and anti-realist positions.

Author Information

C. M. Lorkowski
University of Cincinnati
U. S. A.

Anne-Thérèse Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de Lambert (1647—1733)

LambertA prominent salonnière in the France of Louis XIV and the Regency, Madame de Lambert authored numerous essays dealing with philosophical issues.  Her most famous works, twin sets of instructions to her son and daughter, analyze the virtues to be cultivated by each gender in the aristocracy.  Men pursue glory while women focus on humility.  During the literary querelle de la femme, Lambert defends the dignity of women against misogynist stereotypes advanced by opponents of gender equality.  In her political writings, she criticizes the vices typical of the hierarchical society of the period, especially the unequal distribution of material goods.  The era’s distortion of friendship and mistreatment of the elderly also receive critical scrutiny.  Her religious philosophy leans toward the God of deism: a Supreme Being who should be honored for the works of creation but whose attributes do not transcend the categories of human reason.  Several works in aesthetics treat the subjective problem of taste and sensibility.  Throughout her writings, Lambert manifests her allegiance to a Cartesian understanding of the nature of philosophical analysis.  The French Enlightenment recognized the philosophical value of her works, most of which were published posthumously.  Fontenelle, Montesquieu, and Voltaire are the most prominent of the Enlightenment thinkers who lauded the philosophical acumen of Lambert.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Virtue Theory
    2. Gender and Dignity
    3. Ethics of Love
    4. Social Criticism
    5. Religious Philosophy
    6. Aesthetics
    7. Cartesianism
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

On September 25, 1647, Anne-Thérèse Marguenat de Courcelles was born in Paris to a provincial aristocratic family from the region of Troyes.  Both the paternal and maternal sides of the family had acquired substantial wealth from commercial transactions.  An administrator in the Chambre des Comptes, her father Étienne died on May 22, 1650.  Her mother Monique Passart then secretly married François Le Coigneux, seigneur de la Roche Turpin et de Bachaumont.  Anne-Thérèse received formal instruction at the convent of the Annonciades in Meulan, but it was her stepfather who cultivated the young Ann-Thérèse’s philosophical opinions.  A respected poet and memorialist, Bachamount introduced his stepdaughter to the neo-Epicurean philosophy he espoused in his writings.  He guided her study of the classics and helped to shape her limpid writing style in French.

On February 22, 1666, Anne-Thérèse married Henri de Lambert, marquis de Saint-Bris en Auxerrois, baron de Chitry et Augy.  Henceforth, she will be addressed as Marquise de Lambert or simply Madame de Lambert.  Descended from a provincial aristocratic family in Perigord, Henri de Lambert was a military officer who at the time of the marriage served as the captain of the First Company of the Royal Regiment of the Cavalry.  The marriage produced four children, one of whom died shortly after birth.

On June 12, 1684, Henri de Lambert reached the pinnacle of his political career when he was named governor of the duchy of Luxembourg.    He died suddenly on August 1, 1686.  His death was quickly followed by the death of their eleven-year old daughter, Monique.  The bereaved Madame de Lambert faced imminent impoverishment since she was locked in a lawsuit with her mother over the estate of her deceased father.  Estimated at over five-hundred thousand pounds in worth, the estate had been left entirely to Madame de Lambert’s mother by virtue of a will signed by her father.  The bitter adjudication of the will and the conflicting claims of mother and daughter did not end even with the mother’s death in 1692.  A royal pension permitted Madame de Lambert to survive and her two remaining children to pursue their education until the juridical controversy was settled largely in Lambert’s favor in the late 1690s.

In 1698 an economically secure Madame de Lambert opened her new residence in the Hôtel de Nevers in Paris.  Starting in 1710, she conducted a salon in the drawing room of her residence; it soon became the most intellectually distinguished salon in the capital.  She became noted for her contrasting “Tuesday” and “Wednesday” salons.  Tuesdays were devoted to men and women of letters.  Participants were expected to read aloud their works in progress and to debate the literary issues of the moment.  Wednesdays were devoted to more social receptions for the aristocracy living in the capital.

Prominent salon members included the philosophers Fontenelle and Montesquieu, the dramatist Marivaux, the classicist Anne Dacier, the poet Catherine Bernard, the theologian Fénelon, the tale-writer Marie-Catherine d’Aulnoy, and the mathematician Dortous de Mairan.  The intellectual distinction of Lambert’s salon earned it the sobriquet of bureau d’esprit (the business office of wit.)  The salon also earned a reputation as a place of literary intrigue, especially for lobbying for positions in the prestigious Académie française.  Lambert herself was credited with successfully lobbying for the appointment of Montesquieu from her “antechamber to the Académie.”  Although Lambert banned political and religious discussions from the salon sessions, her salon enjoyed a mildly libertine reputation.  She defended Montesquieu’s controversial Persian Letters, censured for its alleged religious skepticism, and supported Antoine Houdar de la Motte’s attacks on the neoclassical veneration of Homer and of the three unities in drama.

In the salon Madame Lambert shared her own writings with her guests.  Her early works were moral exhortations to her son and daughter respectively as they entered adulthood.  Later writings dealt with friendship, old age, and aesthetics.  Her writings were usually written in the form of a brief essay, modeled after her beloved Montaigne, and often incorporated the miniature literary genres then popular in the salons: maxim, literary portrait, literary dialogue, edifying tale.  Madame Lambert’s writings were written uniquely for diffusion in manuscript copies to members of her salon.  When a pirated edition of her Counsels of a Mother to her Son appeared in print in 1726, she vehemently protested and bought out what remained of the edition.  Publication of a book for public sale in the bookstalls of France was considered inappropriate for an aristocratic woman of the period; furthermore, the intimate details of family life revealed in these essays addressed to her children were not meant to be shared with the general public.  Despite Lambert’s protests, pirated print editions of her essays continued to sell briskly and quickly led to unauthorized translations into English.

Although her salon continued to flourish, the last years of Lambert’s life were darkened by the death of her daughter Monique-Thérèse in 1731 and by recurrent bouts of illness.  Madame de Lambert died on July 12, 1733.

2. Works

The works of Madame de Lambert attracted a broad European public from the time of the first pirated editions published during her lifetime: Counsels of a Mother to her Son (1726), New Reflections on Women (1727), and Counsels of a Mother to Her Editor (1728).  Her collected works enjoyed numerous editions throughout the eighteenth century (1747, 1748, 1750, 1751, 1758, 1761, 1766, 1774, 1785).  The English translation of her collected works enjoyed similar popularity in multiple editions (1749, 1756, 1769, 1770, 1781).  A German translation of the works appeared in 1750, a Spanish edition in 1781.

Most of Lambert’s extant works are written in the form of a brief essay, with occasional exercises in literary dialogue and literary portraiture.  The following works treat philosophical issues.  Counsels of a Mother to her Son analyzes the moral virtues an aristocratic man must develop; Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter examines the moral virtues essential for the aristocratic woman.  Treatise on Friendship studies the power and difficulty of ethical friendship.  Treatise on Old Age laments the neglect of the elderly in contemporary society.  Reflections on Wealth decries materialism.  Reflections on Taste and Discourse on the Delicacy of Mind and of Sentiment examine aesthetic judgment.  Psyche analyzes the nature of the human soul.  Dialogue between Alexander and Diogenes criticizes the false glory represented by warriors such as Alexander the Great.

The philosophical influences on Lambert are not difficult to identify.  Since her childhood, Lambert carefully noted striking phrases from her reading.  In many of her writings, she uses quotations to justify her argument.  Two groups of thinkers predominate.  The first are classical authors with a marked Stoic orientation: Plutarch, Seneca, Marcus Aurelius, and Cicero.  The second are contemporary French authors often considered moralistes, because of their exploration of moral psychology, especially the deceptions of the human mind.  Prominent in this second group are Montaigne, La Rochefoucauld, La Bruyère, Pascal, Fénelon and Saint-Evremond.  So frequent is Lambert’s use of quotation that some critics have dismissed her writings as a tissue of paraphrases.  But Lambert transforms her sources to accommodate her own concerns, notably her concern about the status of women.  Lambert cites Cicero’s dissertation on old age but her own essay contains considerations on the impoverishment of aging women that are absent in Cicero.  Similarly, the marquise admits the debt of her Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter to Fénelon’s Education of Girls but nowhere does Fénelon develop the argument for the philosophical education of women which Lambert pursues in her own text.

3. Philosophical Themes


Madame Lambert’s writings focus on philosophical themes that preoccupied the more intellectual Parisian salons of the period.  In her discussion of the virtues, she makes careful distinctions on the various types of moral virtue, with particular interest in the aristocratic virtue of glory.  Like other salonnières, she analyzes the gradations of love and constructs an apology for chaste, intellectual love between adults of the opposite sex.  Lambert’s interest in pedagogy springs from the conviction that formation in virtue constitutes the chief purpose of education.  Despite her loyalty to the French throne, she criticizes the social injustices of French society, especially its unequal distribution of material wealth, and condemns what she considers the major vices of her own social class.  Her philosophical reflections on art focus primarily on the subjective issue of aesthetic appreciation, notably taste and delicacy.  A practicing Catholic, she develops a religious philosophy more attuned to the emerging deism of the period.  God is the Supreme Being affirmed by rational reflection on the cosmos rather than the personal redeemer known through revelation and grace.  Relatively secondary, the virtues of religion are assimilated to the more generic moral virtues of moderation, prudence, and integrity.  Lambert’s works develop a gendered philosophy not only because they defend the dignity of women against the misogyny of the period, but because they treat such issues as friendship, education, and old age through the lens of gender differentiation.

a. Virtue Theory

Lambert’s intertwined theories of virtue and education emerge in her two most popular works, Counsels of a Mother to her Son and Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter.  In both works, Lambert exhorts her children to grow in virtue as they leave adolescence and begin the commitments of adulthood.  She praises the moral habits they have already acquired through their earlier formal education and advises them on the moral dispositions they must obtain in the future.  But the virtues central for men are not the same as those vital for women.  Like other men, especially those of the nobility destined for military service, her son must pursue glory and its associated public virtues.  Like other women, destined primarily for household duties, her daughter should cultivate the more hidden virtues clustered around humility.

For men, the acquisition of the virtue of glory constitutes their highest aspiration.  According to Lambert, society has rightly named military valor as the chief title to this virtue.  “The glory of heroes is the most brilliant.  True marks of honor and acclaim are attached to it.  Renown seems personally designed for these men.”  In pursuing such glory, men must refuse to limit their ambition through a constraining personal modesty.  In fact, such ambition is necessary for gentlemen pursuing glory as long as they refrain from unfair attacks on their enemies or rivals.  Lambert conceives the virtue of glory as central to political as well as personal masculine development.  Political order is founded on a social contract using the aspiration to glory as a guarantor of civic cohesion.  “Men found that it was necessary and useful for them to unite together for the sake of the common good.  They made laws to punish the evil.  They agreed among themselves what constituted the basic duties of society and attached the idea of glory to the proper practice of these duties.”

The pursuit of grandeur in the military and broader civic forum requires men to develop other social virtues.  Like other salonnières of the period, Lambert emphasizes the virtue of honesty (honnêteté), a personal integrity that permits the gentleman to witness the needs of others and to serve them without excessive preoccupation.  “If you want to be a perfectly honest man, consider disciplining your self-love and give it a good object.  Honesty consists in emptying oneself of focusing on one’s own rights and in respecting the rights of others.”  Unlike true glory, with its attendant concern for others, false glory encourages self-gratification and ignores the misery of the other.  “Why is it that in this infinite number of desires fabricated by voluptuousness and indulgence one never finds the desire to provide relief for the unfortunate?  Doesn’t simple humanity make one feel the need to aid one’s fellow humans?  Moral hearts feel more greatly the obligation to do good than they do the other necessities of life.”  For Lambert, the cultivation of this altruistic honesty naturally entails the pursuit of other similarly discreet social virtues: politeness, tact, delicacy, and wisdom. Such honesty preserves the gentleman from the typical moral vices of the courtier: envy and avarice.

Unlike men, women are not called to cultivate the social virtues proper to the political sphere; they should develop virtues more appropriate to the domestic sphere of the household.  “Women are not called to partake in visible and brilliant virtues; rather, they pursue simple and quiet virtues.”  Glory, the central virtue of men, has no role in the retired life of women.  “The virtues of women are difficult because glory does not help to practice them.  These virtues are hidden: living with oneself; limiting one’s government to one’s family; being simple, just, and modest.”  Among other virtues of self-effacement, women are called to pursue humility and temperance.  Like the opposite sex, women must cultivate the virtues of honesty and politeness, but their participation in the civic sphere remains more circumscribed than that assigned by Lambert to men.

Despite this limitation of female moral culture to the province of the household, Lambert argues that women must develop a substantial set of intellectual virtues.  She insists that women should maintain an intellectual curiosity that leads to a lifetime of learning.  “Curiosity is knowledge that has already begun; it will make one go faster and further in the path of truth.  It is a natural inclination which goes beyond formal instruction.  It must not be stopped by sloth or soft living.” The educational program commended by Lambert for her daughter indicates the substantial intellectual culture Lambert considers desirable for aristocratic women.  The program includes the study of Greek, Roman, and French history; the study of ethics through the writings of Cicero and Pliny; the study of literature, especially the tragedies of Corneille; and the study of Latin.  Lambert adds a Cartesian note to this ambitious neoclassical curriculum by her approval of the study of philosophy.  “[I commend] especially the new sort [of philosophy], if one is capable of it; it will cultivate precision in one’s mind, clarify one’s thoughts, and teach one to think correctly.”  This apology for serious intellectual, specifically philosophical, formation for women is allied to the critique of the neglect of women’s education with which she opens Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter.  “Throughout time we have neglected the education of women; we only paid attention to that of men.  We acted as if women were a different kind of species.  We abandoned them to themselves without any assistance and without the slightest consideration that they constitute half of the world.”

Despite this gendered differentiation in the treatment of the moral virtues, men and women are summoned to develop one virtue in common: the capacity to live by oneself and to rely on one’s own rational judgment.  This neo-Stoic ability to find interior rational peace is the key to mature happiness for both sexes.  Counsels of a Mother to her Son describes this virtue as “the happiness of knowing how to live with oneself, to find oneself with pleasure, to leave oneself with regret.”  In Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter, Lambert exhorts her daughter to “learn that the greatest science is to know how to be alone with yourself….Provide yourself with an interior place of retreat or asylum.  There you can always return to yourself and find yourself.”  In this contemplative self-possession, wherein the passions are subordinated to reason, both men and women discover the interior resources to combat the vicissitudes of existence, especially of reversal of fortune.

b. Gender and Dignity

In New Reflections On Women, Lambert provides an apology for the dignity and rights of women.  The essay criticizes the misogyny which has denied women a proper education.  “Can’t women say to men, ‘What right do you have to forbid us to study the sciences and fine arts?  Haven’t women who have devoted themselves to these disciplines produced both sublime and useful objects?’”  As contemporary examples of such success, the essay cites Madame de la Sablière, an astronomer, and the many recent women novelists.  Lambert laments the decline of the salons which had earlier contributed to the artistic and philosophical formation of women.  “In other times there were houses where it was permitted to speak and to think, where the Muses held company with the Graces….These houses were like the Banquet of Plato.”  The social constitution which reduces women to inferiors and denies them the possibility of scientific culture does not reflect nature or rights; it is simply a corporate act of violence by men to retain their supremacy and to maintain the domestic services of women without appropriate compensation.  “By force rather than by natural right, men have usurped authority over women.”  The period’s art, notably Molière’s parody of the précieuses in Women Scholars, conspires to persuade women that their legal subjection and exclusion from serious education is a product of nature rather than of culpable oppression.

Despite her critique of the period’s subjection of women, Lambert accepts the common argument that the difference between the genders is psychological and not only biological.  In particular, she accepts the argument advanced by Malebranche that women have a more active faculty of imagination than do men.  But whereas Malebranche and others had drawn the conclusion that this hyperactive imagination prevents women from exercising reason (and concomitantly from governing others), Lambert draws the opposite conclusion.  The essay claims that women’s natural vivacity of imagination and sentiment actually perfects the operations of reason.  Rather than being the antagonist of reason, imagination incites reason to undertake great projects and makes the fruits of reasoning more persuasive to the public.  “I do not think that sentiment weakens the mind; on the contrary, it provides new spiritual powers which illuminate the mind.  It makes the ideas present in the mind livelier, clearer, and more distinct….Persuasion of the heart is higher than that of the mind alone because our conduct often depends on the former.  It is to our imagination and to our heart that nature has committed the conduct of our actions and of its motives.”  Rather than being inferior to men, women appear to possess a certain mental superiority.  The success of ancient and contemporary women in the arts and sciences indicates that they are as capable as are men in pursuing intellectual activities.  Only social prejudice, expressed through the denial of appropriate education, explains the comparative paucity of women who have distinguished themselves in these fields.  The alleged greater attachment of women to the exercise of the imagination and of the sentiments in their decision-making only indicates that in an atmosphere free of gender prejudice women will exercise reason with a greater complement of imagery and of passion than do most men.

c. Ethics of Love

In several works, Lambert focuses on the central issue of salon debate: the nature of love.  She insists on the moral qualities necessary for authentic love and decries the descent into sexual debauchery that has characterized several prominent salons of the Regency.  The chaste love of mature friendship is both more desirable and more difficult to attain than is the passion-based love of romance.  Intellectual love between adults of the opposite sex constitutes the apex of this ideal moral friendship.

New Reflections on Women defines love as the central sentiment of human life.  Due to its interiority and its power, love enjoys a primacy among human sentiments.  “The difference between love and other pleasures is easy to detect for those who have been touched by it.  In order to be felt, most pleasures require the presence of the proper external object.  Music, cuisine, and theater are examples of pleasures that must have their immediate object in order to make their impressions, to call the soul to them and to hold the soul attentive….It is not the same with love.  It is within us, it is a part of ourselves.  It does not only exist in tandem with its corresponding object; we can experience love without the presence of the object.”  The superiority of love over other desires springs from the capacity of its sentiments to dominate the moral agent even in the absence of the beloved other person.  Memory and imagination deepen the force of a sentimental state that can captivate the human subject on the basis of fantasy alone.

Despite Lambert’s correlation of love with pleasure, Treatise on Friendship underscores that the highest form of love is disinterested friendship among peers rather than romantic affection.  Such mature friendship is based on virtue rather than passion.  “The first merit we must seek in our friends is virtue.  This is what assures us that they are capable and worthy of friendship.  We should expect nothing from our relationships which lack this foundation.”  Focused on the needs of the other, authentic friendship frees one from self-preoccupation and encourages altruistic service of the beloved.  “Friendship is a relationship, a contract, or a type of reciprocal commitment where one demands nothing, where the most worthy person gives more than is expected and is happy to do so in advance.  One shares one’s fortune with one’s friend: wealth, credit, concern, services, everything except one’s honor.”  Only in this virtuous friendship is the human person freed from the calculation of conquest and approval which characterizes most interpersonal affection.

Departing from its classical precedents, Treatise on Friendship argues that such a virtuous, altruistic friendship is not limited to peers of the same sex.  Chaste, intellectual friendship between members of the opposite sex constitutes the highest embodiment of such a meritorious relationship since it demands strict discipline of one’s personal passions.  “They ask if friendship can endure among members of different sex.   Although it is rare and difficult, this is the most delightful of friendships.  It is the most difficult because it requires more virtue and more restraint.”  At its apogee in altruistic friendship, the sentiment of love is so thoroughly refined by the rational will that the passions can no longer distort it.

d. Social Criticism

Like other moralistes of the period, Lambert criticizes the injustices of French society.  Economic inequality constitutes one of the principal injustices of this highly stratified society.  Avarice constitutes the major vice of an aristocracy transformed into avid courtiers.

Reflections on Wealth describes the rapacious efforts to acquire material wealth as a distortion of the human quest for happiness.  Whereas human beings can only find authentic happiness in the intellectual and moral goods of the soul, the social elite seeks an illusory happiness in the amassment of ever-increasing fortunes.  Such wealth may procure social approval and temporary pleasure, but the illusory nature of this unstable pleasure inevitably manifests itself.  “Riches are vain in their use and insatiable in their possession of us.  They are vain because of the false idea they give of themselves.  This idea is founded not on our real being but on our imaginary being.  Everything surrounding those favored with wealth serves their illusions.”  This illusion magnifies the egocentrism of a humanity marked by the fall.  Other people, even the earth itself (with its deposits of precious metals), become objects which exist to be exploited by and to adorn an aristocracy poisoned by avarice.

Despite its moral tares, this human avidity possesses a certain public utility.  The desire to be admired for one’s wealth-related grandeur drives many of the wealthy to provide a material assistance toward the poor which they would not otherwise give.  “Nothing is so great and nothing gives us such an illustrious position in the imagination of others as does the contribution of our wealth to the public weal.  Making one’s wealth flow to so many unfortunates is to give them a new type of existence which pulls them out of their desperate state.”  Like many social thinkers of the eighteenth-century, Lambert identifies material self-interest as the motor of public philanthropy.

Lambert’s critique of the intolerable lot of the poor in contemporary French society becomes explicitly gendered in her Treatise of Old Age.  It is women who bear the brunt of the material impoverishment and psychological isolation of old age.  “Throughout their lives, we have given men all the assistance necessary to perfect their reason and to teach them the great science of happiness.  Cicero composed a treatise on old age to help them draw benefits from an age where everything seems to leave us.  We do this work only for men.  For women in all ages, on the contrary, we simply abandon them to themselves.  We neglect their education in their youth.  During the rest of their lives, we deprive them of the support they need for their old age.  As a result, the majority of women live without care and without the ability to reflect on their state.  In their youth they are vain and dissipated; in their old age, frail and disheveled.”  It is the deprivation of education, especially of the methodical formation of reason and of the capacity for personal reflection, which provokes the material and psychological impoverishment of women, once their romantic and maternal utility has vanished.  The result of neither nature nor accident, this impoverishment of aging women reflects the gender imbalance of a society centered around the needs of men.

e. Religious Philosophy

Lambert’s writings exhibit the nascent deism of the period.  Although she repeatedly praises the virtue of piety, Lambert accords religious virtues a palpably secondary role in the constellation of moral virtues she commends to her readers.  Religion provides a cornerstone for the moral virtues the human person must cultivate, but the deity presiding over this religious theology is the deist Supreme Being rather than the biblical God of redemption and grace.

The deistic character of Lambert’s religious philosophy appears clearly in her Counsels of a Mother to her Son.  Although she insists that the greatest duty of the son is to “render worship to the Supreme Being,” this religious sentiment is markedly constricted.  The purpose of religion is to inspire the moral agent to fulfill his or her duties.  Prayer is an occasion to compare oneself with the moral order God has manifested in the cosmos.  “Moral virtues are in danger without the Christian ones.  I do not ask from you a piety full of weaknesses and superstition; I only ask that a love of moral order would submit to God your inclinations and your sentiments and that the same love of order would spill over on your conduct.  That will give you justice and the presence of justice will guarantee the existence of all the virtues.”  Religion is instrumentalized as an efficacious tool of moral formation and motivation.  Communion with God is based not on grace but on rational scrutiny of one’s conformity to the moral order detectable in nature.  It is the natural virtue of justice, and not the supernatural virtues of faith, hope, and charity, which constitutes the apex of the moral virtues fostered by an enlightened religiosity shorn of irrationality and superstition.

The religious virtue praised by Lambert is generic in nature.  Respect for religion entails respect for the particular religion established by the sovereign of the state.  “One does not attack religion when one has no interest in attacking it.  Nothing makes one happier than having the mind convinced and the heart touched by religion.  That is a good in all times.  Even those who are not fortunate enough to believe as they choose should submit to the established religion.  They know that what is called ‘prejudice’ has great standing in society and that it must be respected.”   The treatment of religious truth in this passage is markedly skeptical.  The assimilation of religion to a popular ‘prejudice’ is not refuted; it is simply useful to respect such a widespread belief, even if it is tainted by custom and bias.  The particular religion to be respected and embraced varies from one society to another, since it is the religious confession established by the state.  In France, this is Catholicism defended by the monarchy, but in other cultures this can easily be another religious confession whose tenets are enforced by a different type of political sovereignty.

Other writings, notably Counsels of a Mother to Daughter and Treatise on Old Age, commend the virtue of piety to women.  But despite the occasional Christian references, the religious sentiment lauded by Lambert remains closer to rationalist deism than to the Catholic sentiment of adoration and submission rooted in grace.

f. Aesthetics

In several works, Lambert studies the subjective dimension of aesthetics.  She explores how the taste for beauty develops in the human mind.  She also studies the related mental qualities of delicacy and refinement, which permit the human person to recognize beauty in nature or in artifacts.

Reflections on Taste concedes an irreducible subjectivity to the phenomenon of taste.  Whereas discursive reasoning inevitably leads to certain conclusions according to the rules of logic and of evidence, judgments of taste often evince irresolvable contradictions.  “Taste is the first movement and a type of instinct which draws us and guides us more surely than all the work of reason.  There is no necessary agreement among tastes.  This is not the same thing as among truths.  It is obvious that whoever concedes my premises will also agree with the consequences I draw.  In this way one may lead an intelligent person to accept one’s opinion, but one is never sure that one can lead a sensitive person to one’s judgment of taste.  There are no links or enticements to make someone else agree with this judgment.  Nothing is certain in the domain of taste; everything springs from the disposition of one’s interior organs and the relationship established between them and external objects.”  Despite its power over the human person’s judgment, taste delivers subjective judgments inasmuch as it depends on the physiology and the psychology unique to each person in the exercise of aesthetic perception.

Despite this subjective dimension, the essay insists that some judgments of taste are more justified than are others.   Although taste eludes analytic definition, it can be evoked intuitively for those who have experienced the difference in quality of aesthetic judgments.  “Right taste delivers a proper judgment on everything we call pleasing, satisfying, fitting, fine, or, so to speak, the flora of the soul.  It is this je ne sais quoi of wisdom and of skillfulness, which knows what is appropriate and which senses in each object the correct proportion it must possess.”  Although judgments of taste do not follow the strict logic of discursive reason, they are not arbitrary.  Irreducible to a formula, experience indicates that certain minds excel in the recognition of the obscure formal qualities that constitute the beauty of an external object.

Against emotivism and relativism, Lambert argues that the faculty of taste possesses a partial intellectual dimension.  “Up to the present, good taste has been defined as ‘a custom established for the members of high society who are sophisticated and discriminating.’  I think that good taste depends on two things: a sentiment of great delicacy in the heart and a great correctness in the mind.”  If Lambertian taste begins as a subjective movement of instinct and feeling, it only reaches its mature term when the intellect has refined this initial impression through a scrutiny of the formal qualities, especially the harmony and balance, of the external object under consideration.

g. Cartesianism

Lambert’s writings make few explicit references to Descartes, but her writings are suffused with Cartesian philosophy.  Although the degree of her personal knowledge of the texts of Descartes remains unclear, Lambert clearly imbibed the pervasive Cartesianism of the salons, militantly diffused in her own salon by Fontenelle.

The literary portrait Monsieur de la Motte provides a Cartesian definition of philosophy.  “To philosophize is to render to reason all its dignity and to make it enter into its rights.  It is to relate each object to its proper principles.  It is to shake off the yoke of opinion and of authority.”  In its attack on public opinion and appeals to authority as the antonym of right reason, this rationalist concept of philosophy clearly follows the path of Cartesianism.

In several works, this Cartesian apology for reason warns the reader of the dangers of reliance on public opinion.  Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter emphasizes the necessity to abandon prejudice, custom, and public opinion if one seeks to reason properly.  “Give yourself a true idea of things.  Don’t judge like the common people do.  Don’t yield your judgment to that of public opinion.  Throw off the prejudices of childhood.”  Similarly, the Dialogue between Alexander and Diogenes on the Equality of Goods condemns Alexander the Great’s reliance on the esteem of the public.  “I know very well that you [Alexander] have the masses for you.  The number of the wise is very small.  As much as you are a prince, you are still a man of the common people in your way of thinking.  Always dependant on the opinion of other people, you place your happiness in the judgments of others.”   It is Diogenes, the representative of the intellectual elite which relies on reason rather than on fluctuating public opinion, who has access to the truth.

Lambert’s Cartesian orientation often emerges in her treatment of specific areas of human endeavor.  Counsels of a Mother to Her Son considers history, focused on human passions and chance events, as inferior to the study of metaphysics, where the student can discover universal, immutable principles.  “Your ordinary reading must be history, but you must join reflection to it.  Don’t think of filling your memory with facts, of decorating your mind with the thoughts and opinions of authors.  This would only turn your mind into a store filled with the ideas of other people.  A quarter of an hour of reflection does more to deepen and form the mind than do hours of reading.  You should not fear a lack of knowledge; rather, you should fear error and false judgments.  Reflection is the guide leading to truth.”  Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter closely follows Descartes’s Discourse on Method in its exemption of religion from the rationalist censure of appeals to authority.  “In the area of religion, one must yield to authorities, but on every other subject, one must only accept the authority of reason and of evidence.”  As a result of this split in warrants between religious and non-religious knowledge, theological belief becomes a matter of arational assent.  “As a great man [Malebranche] said, ‘To be a Christian, one must believe blindly; to be wise, one must see the evidence.”  In this Cartesian framework, reason is not only to be exercised in metaphysics and science to discover indubitable, immutable principles; it is be used in other areas of human life to eliminate or at least to temper the weight of authority and custom on human judgment.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The reception of Madame de Lambert’s writings and philosophy has been checkered.  In the eighteenth century a large, cultivated European public purchased numerous editions of her works in French, English, German, and Spanish.  French Enlightenment philosophers, notably Bayle, Fontenelle, Montesquieu, and Voltaire, praised her contribution to moral philosophy.  By the late nineteenth century, however, Lambert was little read.  It is significant that the first twentieth-century edition of Lambert’s works occurred only at the very end of the century (1990) with Granderoute’s critical edition.

Several factors explain the eclipse of Lambert’s philosophy.  First, the marquise wrote in the style of literary miniatures that were popular in the salons of the period.  She often expressed her philosophy in the genre of the essay, the literary dialogue, the maxim, or the literary portrait.  Genres that appeared charming in the boudoirs of the Regency often appeared precious to a later literary public.  Written outside the framework of the systematic treatise, the essays’ arguments on virtue or politics or aesthetics often seemed unphilosophical to a later philosophical public accustomed to university norms of academic argument.

Second, Madame de Lambert wrote from and for a philosophical culture which has vanished.  She could presume that her listeners had studied the Stoicism of Plutarch and Cicero in their schooldays as she had.  Even indirect references to the classical authors would be immediately grasped.  Paraphrases of Montaigne or Pascal required no further explanation.  Any educated Frenchman or Frenchwoman in the early eighteenth century would possess at least a hazy outline of the skepticism represented by each of these masters of modern French prose.

The recent renaissance of philosophical interest in Lambert is tied to the neo-feminist expansion of the cannon of the humanities in early modernity.  Several recent studies focus on the question of gender and the status of women in Lambert.  The interpretations offered by Fassiotto (1984) and Beasely (1992) illustrate this tendency.  Other contributions by Lambert to moral philosophy, such as her virtue theory and her critique of the influence of popular opinion on moral judgment, await further research.

5. References and Further Reading

All translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Lambert, Anne-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. Oeuvres complètes de madame la marquise de Lambert. Paris: L. Collin, 1808.
    • A digital version of this edition of the works of Madame de Lambert is available at Gallica: bibliothèque numérique on the website of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.
  • Lambert, Anne-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. Oeuvres, ed. Robert Granderoute. Paris: Librairie Honoré Champion, 1990.
    • This excellent critical edition of the works of Madame de Lambert has become the standard scholarly edition.
  • Lambert, Ann-Thérèse de Marguenat de Courcelles, marquise de. The Works of the Marchionesse de Lambert. Containing Thoughts on various entertaining and useful Subjects, Reflections on Education, on the writings of Homer and on various public Events of the Time. Carefully Translated from the French. London: William Owen, 1749.
    • This first English translation of the collected works of Madame de Lambert underwent four re-editions in the eighteenth century.  Digital texts of the English versions of several of Lambert’s works can be found at the following Internet sites: American Libraries Internet Archive and Google Book Search.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Barth-Cao Danh, Michèle. La philosophie cognitive et morale d’Anne-Thérèse de Lambert, 1647-1733: La volonté d’être. New York: Peter Lang, 2002.
    • This original monograph studies the epistemology of Madame de Lambert.
  • Beasely, Faith. “Anne-Thérèse de Lambert and the Politics of Taste,” Papers on French Seventeenth Century Literature, 1992, Vol. 19; no.37: 337-44.
    • The article focuses on gender in its analysis of aesthetic judgment and politics in Lambert.
  • Daniélou, Catherine. “L’amour-propre éclairé: Madame de Lambert et Pierre Nicole,” Papers on French Seventeenth Century Literature, 1995, Vol. 22, no. 42: 171-83.
    • [Daniélou contrasts the link between self-love and social utility in the philosophies of Lambert and of the Jansenist Nicole
  • Fassiotto, Marie-José. Madame de Lambert (1644-1733), ou, Le féminism moral. New York: Peter Lang, 1984.
    • Fassiotto explores gender issues in Lambert but the attribution of feminism is anachronistic.
  • Granderoute, Robert. “Madame de Lambert et Montaigne,” Bulletin de la Société des Amis de Montaigne, 1981, nos. 7-8: 97-106.
    • Granderoute demonstrates the dependence of Lambert on the thought and texts of Montaigne.
  • Granderoute, Robert. “De l’Education des filles aux Avis d’une mère à une fille: Fénelon et madame de Lambert,” Revue d’Histoire littéraire de la France,” 1987, no. 1: 15-30.
    • Granderoute examines the influence of Fénelon on Lambert’s educational philosophy.
  • Hine, Ellen McNiven. Madame de Lambert, her Sources and her Circle. Oxford: The Voltaire Foundation, 1973.
    • Hine studies Lambert’s ancient and contemporary intellectual sources.
  • Hoffman, Paul. “Madame de Lambert et l’exigence de dignité,” Travaux de linguistique et de littérature, 1973, vol. 11, no. 2: 19-32.
    • Hoffman analyzes the central concept of dignity in the ethics and political thought of Lambert.
  • Kryssing-Berg, Ginette, “La marquise de Lambert ou l’ambivalence de la vertu,” Revue Romane, 1982, Vol. 17: 35-45.
    • Kryssing-Berg studies the tension between virtue and social utility in Lambert’s ethics.
  • Marchal, Roger. Madame de Lambert et son milieu. Oxford: The Voltaire Foundation, 1991.
    • Marchal examines the aristocratic and salon context of Lambert’s thought.

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon (1635—1719)

maintenonThe second wife of King Louis XIV of France, Madame de Maintenon has long fascinated historians and novelists by her improbable life.  Born into an impoverished, criminal family, Maintenon conquered salon society as the wife of the poet Paul Scarron. During her salon years, she studied the philosophical currents of the period, notably libertinism and Cartesianism.  Maintenon then conquered court society as the governess of the illegitimate children of King Louis XIV and finally as the wife of the widowed King. The controversies surrounding her social ascent have long obscured the contributions of Maintenon to educational and moral philosophy. The founder and director of the celebrated school for women at Saint-Cyr, Maintenon defended her theories of education for women in a series of addresses to the Saint-Cyr faculty. In her pedagogical philosophy, practical moral formation rather than intellectual cultivation emerges as the primary goal of schooling.  Her dramatic dialogues and addresses to students developed her distinctive moral philosophy, based on detailed analysis of the moral virtues to be cultivated by the pupils.  In her account of the cardinal virtues, temperance holds pride of place. Addressing Saint-Cyr’s student body of aristocratic girls and women, Maintenon devoted particular attention to the virtues of civility essential for polite society. Her philosophy of virtues is a gendered one inasmuch as Maintenon attempted to redefine traditionally masculine virtues in terms of current female experience.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Philosophy of Education
    2. Virtue Theory
    3. Virtue and Gender
    4. Virtue and Class
  4. Reception and Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Françoise d’Augbigné was born on November 27-28, 1635, allegedly in the prison of Niort in central France.  Her father Constant d’Aubigné was a career criminal who had received jail terms for murder, kidnapping, treason, and debt.  Disowned by his father Agrippa d’Aubigné, a prominent Huguenot military officer and poet, Constant d’Aubigné had married Jeanne de Cardhilac, daughter of Niort’s prison warden, in 1627.  Françoise’s harrowing childhood included a stay in Martinique (1645-1647) during one of her father’s failed political adventures; a bitter stay with a distant relative who used her as a domestic servant (1648); tempestuous periods at Ursuline convent schools in Niort and Paris (1648); and a painful return to her impoverished mother (1649-1652), during which time the young Françoise was forced to beg in the streets.  A personal witness to the religious divisions of the period, she was baptized Catholic by her mother at birth, raised as a Protestant by her kindly aunt, Madame de Villette, and then converted to Catholicism by her Ursuline teachers.  The adolescent study of Plutarch introduced her to the period’s vogue for Stoicism and cultivated her lifelong taste for the literature of moral edification.

In 1652 Françoise d’Aubigné married her only suitor: the poet Paul Scarron.  The odd match became an object of ridicule in the Parisian salons.  Twenty-five years her senior, Scarron was a paralyzed, impotent satirist renowned for the vitriol of his verse burlesques.  Despite its unpromising origins, the marriage proved a reasonable success.  Madame Scarron patiently nursed a sickly husband who visibly esteemed his beautiful and intelligent young wife.  The tiny apartment of the Scarrons quickly became a salon for Parisian authors of a libertine bent.  Madame Scarron acquired a philosophical culture from the salon habitués: Benserade, Chapelain, Vivonne, Saint-Aignan, Costar, and Ménage.  She was especially influenced by George Brossin, chevalier de Méré, the essayist who argued that the honnête homme, the temperate person who exercised restraint in arriving at judgments, should be the moral ideal of an age exhausted by religious fanaticism.  During these salon sessions Madame Scarron also read and debated the works of Descartes.

At the death of her husband in 1660, Madame Scarron faced a precarious future, but her salon contacts permitted her to find some financial support and to continue her pursuit of literary and philosophical culture.  In 1669 she accepted a delicate mission: to serve as the governess for the illegitimate children of Louis XIV and her fellow salonnière, Madame de Montespan.  Her skillful education of the children impressed the king and his stormy mistress.  Her expert nursing of their son, the Duke of Maine, during a serious illness appeared to them miraculous.  In 1674, a grateful Louis XIV granted the devoted governess the lands and title of the fief of Maintenon.  Newly ennobled and financially secure, Madame de Maintenon now took her own place as a titled aristocrat among the courtiers of Versailles.  When the affair between Louis XIV and Madame de Montespan collapsed, Maintenon encouraged the king to reconcile with his estranged wife, Marie-Thérèse of Austria.  The successful reconciliation between the spouses enhanced Maintenon’s standing in court but earned her the enmity of her old patron, Madame de Montespan.

After the sudden death of Queen Marie-Thérèse on July 9, 1683, the king drew closer to Maintenon.  On October 9, 1683, the archbishop of Paris married the couple in a private ceremony.  The bride’s modest social origins raised a problem, since Louis XIV had insisted on dynastic marriages for other members of his family.  The marriage was never publicly announced, although the court quickly perceived that Madame de Maintenon had assumed the role and duties of Louis XIV’s legitimate wife.  The private marriage was also morganatic; Maintenon would never assume the title of queen and no relative of hers could claim the right to the throne.

In 1684 Maintenon began her life’s work: the construction of a school for the education of daughters of the impoverished nobility.  Situated in 1686 at Saint-Cyr, the Institute of Saint Louis was generously subsidized by Louis XIV.  Maintenon personally supervised the direction of the school, designed to serve two hundred and fifty students.  The school possessed a comparatively sophisticated curriculum, featuring courses in religion, reading, writing, mathematics, Latin, music, painting, dancing, needlework, and home economics.  Dissatisfied with the narrowly religious education provided by the convent schools of the period, Maintenon founded her own lay group of teachers, the Dames of Saint-Louis, to provide instruction.  Maintenon insisted that dialogue rather than lecture was to be the primary means of education in the Saint-Cyr classroom.

Saint-Cyr underwent three distinct periods in its pedagogical development.  In its artistic period (1686-1689), the school emphasized cultural achievement by its students.  Sophisticated concerts, plays, debates, and liturgical services soon attracted a prestigious Parisian public.  The artistic period achieved its culmination in the world premiere of Jean Racine’s Esther on January 26, 1689.  The cultural triumph of the school, however, created educational problems.  Dazzled by the applause of the court, students began to neglect their studies; class time began to shrink in favor of rehearsals for the elaborate school performances.

During its mystical period (1690-97), Maintenon sought to combat the worldliness of the earlier artistic phase by promoting piety in the school.  The faculty and students soon fell under the influence of Madame de Guyon, a controversial religious leader and friend of Maintenon.  The Quietism promoted by Guyon stressed simplicity in prayer, confidence in God, and retirement from the world.  Maintenon grew disenchanted with a piety that seemed to undercut the acquisition of virtue and ardor in one’s studies and future work.  By the middle of the decade, Maintenon encouraged Louis XIV’s campaign against Quietism and the expulsion of faculty sympathetic to Quietism.

By the end of the seventeenth century, Maintenon had guided Saint-Cyr toward the pedagogical model she would support until her death.  This approach to education stressed the acquisition of moral virtues by the students and development of the practical skills these impoverished women would need in their future lives as wives of provincial aristocrats in straitened financial circumstances.  This practical mode of education, with its distinctive moralistic coloration, would remain the guiding ethos of Saint-Cyr until its dissolution by revolutionaries in 1793.

Given the secret nature of her marriage, Maintenon’s influence on the court of Louis XIV remained a discreet one.  She clearly counseled her husband on religious matters, especially the appointment of bishops and abbots, but her role in the Revocation of the Edict of Nantes and the intensification of anti-Protestant measures by Louis XIV has been exaggerated by later critics.  Her primary interest remained the direction of the school at Saint-Cyr, to which she retired in 1715, shortly after the death of Louis XIV.

Madame de Maintenon died at Saint-Cyr on April 17, 1719.

2. Works

The majority of the works left by Madame de Maintenon originated during her tenure at the Institute of Saint Louis (1686-1719).  The Dames of Saint-Louis carefully transcribed the many addresses Maintenon delivered to the faculty and student body.  Maintenon would then correct and revise the transcriptions.  In addition, she composed dramatic monologues to be performed in class.  The Dames collected these various texts of Madame de Maintenon into a series of manuscript collections, the last and largest of which date from 1740.  In addition, a massive correspondence of over five thousand letters written by Maintenon has survived.  Théophile Lavallée’s multi-volume edition of Maintenon’s writings (1854-66) remains the most thorough print edition of Maintenon, but we remain far from a complete – let alone a critical – edition of her works.

Of particular philosophical importance are the writings where Maintenon treats ethical issues, especially the nature of virtue and vice.  Her Entretiens are conferences with the Saint-Cyr faculty in which Maintenon emphasizes the formation in virtue that is the principal end of education at the school.  Her Instructions are addresses to the students in which she censures the typical vices and exalts the ideal virtues of the student body.  Her Conversations (dialogues) are brief morality plays that define and illustrate the major virtues the student must inculcate.  Maintenon’s approach to ethics is gendered inasmuch as she redefines the virtues and vices, originally defined in terms of male experience, in the framework of typical women’s experience.  Her approach is also class-conscious, since she attempts to redefine the virtues in the perspective of women who are simultaneously aristocratic and impoverished.

3. Philosophical Themes

The primary philosophical interest of Maintenon’s works lies in its treatment of two related topics: educational theory and virtue theory.  For Maintenon, the primary goal of education is the formation of the moral character of the pupil, interpreted according to the canons of Counter-reformational Catholicism.  The secondary goal is vocational formation.  In the case of Saint-Cyr, it is the development of the skills and the moral habits of the pupil who faces the future as a member of the impoverished, provincial nobility.  Maintenon transforms the nature of moral virtue according to the demands of gender and social class.  Traditionally masculine virtues, such as courage, are redefined to serve as the ideal ethical traits of the industrious wife largely confined to the domestic sphere.  Virtues typical of the aristocratic class, notably politeness and civility, are raised to the status of primary moral dispositions.

a. Philosophy of Education

In her addresses to the faculty of Saint-Cyr, Maintenon sketches her philosophy of education.  The ends of education are traditional: the formation of moral character for a Catholic member of the provincial aristocracy.  But the dialogical methods of pedagogy championed by Maintenon exhibit a distinctive modernity.

Of Solid Education explains the educational end of Saint-Cyr for the faculty: “You [the teachers] apply yourself to developing the piety, the reason, and the morals of your girls.  You inspire in them the love and practices of all virtues proper to them now and in the future.”  Maintenon insists that the virtue to be cultivated and the means used to achieve this ethical culture must always be “reasonable,” but this reasonableness is of a practical rather than speculative nature.  Of the Education of Young Ladies specifies how this practical reasonableness differs from erudition or aesthetic achievement: “You [the teachers] should concern yourself less with furnishing their mind than with forming their reason.  Obviously, this approach provides less occasion for the knowledge and skill of the schoolmistress to sparkle.  A young woman who has memorized a thousand things impresses her family and friends more than does a girl who simply knows how to exercise her judgment, when to be silent, how to be modest and reserved, how to avoid rushing into showing what she thinks about something.”  This pedagogical ideal of practical reasonableness underscores the primacy Maintenon accords the virtues of discretion and restraint for aristocratic women, who are often plunged into dangerous political controversies.  It also expresses the mature Maintenon’s disillusionment with the aesthetic and mystical ideals that had earlier served as the educational end of Saint-Cyr.

To maintain the moral atmosphere of the school, Maintenon insists on a strict regime of censorship.  In Of the Danger of Profane Books, she condemns the use of all books that lack explicit religious or moral utility.  “I call profane all books that are not religious, even if they seem innocent, as soon as it is clear that they have no real usefulness.  Teach your pupils to be extremely cautious in their reading.  They should always prefer their needlework, housework, or their duties in their state of life to it.  If they really want to read, ensure that they use carefully chosen books apt to nourish their faith, to cultivate their judgment, and to guide their morals.”  Of the Proper Choice of Theatrical Pieces underlines the risk of heresy as well as of moral corruption run by too lenient a regime of literary surveillance: “Don’t you [the teachers] realize the ease with which you grant entry to these little booklets without preliminary approval exposes your pupils to the greatest dangers?  If the Jansenists and the Quietists knew this weakness, they would immediately find the secret in order to spread their errors.  They would flood you with pamphlets containing the maxims, phrases, and songs which they sell for practically nothing.”  Theoretical instruction in the demands of virtue is insufficient for the actual cultivation of it.  The personal moral modeling by the faculty and the strictly moral and religiously orthodox atmosphere maintained by the faculty in the school are essential for the successful maturation of the Saint-Cyr pupil along the lines of Maintenon’s practical reasonableness.

If character formation is the central goal of education, the teacher must engage in regular dialogue with her pupils.  In her faculty addresses, Maintenon criticizes the tendency of teachers to use lectures and to overvalue the cultivation of the memory of their pupils.  To assist in the perfection of moral character, the schoolmistress should regularly engage in conversation with her pupils.  Of the Education of Ladies argues that teacher-pupil dialogue should occur outside as well as inside the classroom: “On occasion you [the teachers] should be ready to chat informally with your pupils.  This will help the pupils to love and trust you.  You can acquire an influence over them that will prove beneficial.”  The pupil is not to remain passive in this dialogue.  The teacher can function as an accurate spiritual director only if the pupil discloses her actual moral struggles and achievements: “Sometimes you [the teachers] should let them express their will so that you may understand their basic dispositions.  You then more accurately teach them the differences between the good, the evil, and the morally indifferent.”  Maintenon’s insistence on a dialogical method of instruction reflects the value placed on refined conversation in the aristocratic circles of the period; it also expresses the conviction that the pedagogy of moral formation cannot succeed if the moral tutor has not gauged the actual moral temperament of the pupil as the tutor guides her to the school’s ideal of ethical maturity.

b. Virtue Theory

In several works Maintenon analyzes the four cardinal virtues: justice, fortitude, prudence, and temperance.  Strikingly, whereas most philosophers would name justice as the most important virtue, Maintenon prizes temperance as the central virtue in a moral character.  Without the restraining hand of temperance, the other virtues would quickly deteriorate into rigorism, foolhardiness, or fearfulness.

In the dialogue On the Cardinal Virtues, Maintenon defends this primacy of temperance in the ensemble of virtues.  At the beginning of the dialogue, Justice presents its traditional claim as the preeminent virtue: “There is nothing as beautiful as Justice.  It always has truth beside it.  It judges without bias.  It puts everything into order.  It knows how to condemn its friends and to honor the rights of its enemies.  It can even condemn itself.  It only honors what is worthy of honor.”  But the other cardinal virtues soon manifest their eminence over justice by demonstrating why and how the virtue of justice must be subordinated to them in order for justice to actually achieve its social ends.  Prudence prevents justice from acting in too brusque a manner.  “I [prudence] regulate its [justice’s] operations, prevent it from precipitation, make it take its time.”  Similarly, fortitude strengthens justice when justice hesitates to execute proper punishment on a friend.  “You [justice] need me [fortitude] because your sense of affection makes you find it difficult to inflict any pain on a friend.”  While justice can determine where to assign just dessert, the execution of this determination requires the conjugated virtues of prudence and fortitude to avoid the distortions of severity or pusillanimity.

Standing above prudence and fortitude is the virtue of temperance.  It imposes itself as the central virtue inasmuch as it prevents the other virtues from deteriorating into their customary excesses.  “I destroy gluttony and excess.  I tolerate no outbursts. Not only am I opposed to all evil; I moderate all good.  Without me, Justice would be intolerable to human weakness, Fortitude would drive us to despair, Prudence would often prevent us from taking the actions we should and make waste our time weighing every option.  But with me, Justice acquires a capacity for circumspection, Fortitude acquires suppleness, and Prudence continues to provide advice, but now without undue hesitation, without too much or too little haste.  In a word, I am the remedy to all forms of extremism.”  The primacy accorded temperance in the hierarchy of virtue parallels the emphasis accorded the values of discretion and good reputation in the education provided at Saint-Cyr.

Even the virtues of religion must subordinate themselves to the empire of temperance.  Exercises of piety are to be commended only to the extent that they reflect the moderation and sobriety typical of the virtue of temperance.  “I [temperance] must temper a religious zeal that is too busy, too emotional, and indiscreet.  I have to encourage conduct that avoids extremes.  I moderate both the inclination to give alms and the inclination to hoard money.  I moderate the length of prayer, ascetical practices, recollection, silence, and good works.  I shorten a sermon, a spiritual dialogue, or an examination of conscience.”  Echoing Méré’s portrait of the honnête homme, Maintenon’s moral ideal of the student is the woman who subjects all thought and action to the moderating influence of temperance.  Neither the mystic nor the activist represents Maintenon’s ideal of the moral agent who distinguishes herself through the modesty and emotional restraint with which she serves her neighbor.

c. Virtue and Gender

Given her exclusively feminine public of students and faculty, Maintenon often transforms the nature of the virtues in order to accommodate the sex-specific experience of women of the period.  Her gendered transformation of virtue is apparent in her analysis of three particular virtues: courage, glory, and eminence.

The dramatic dialogue On Courage demonstrates how women as well as men are required to cultivate the virtue of courage.  At the beginning of the dialogue, Faustine insists that courage is not proper for women. “Courage is not having any fear.  This type of achievement is not for our sex.”  Victoria counters that, although women are not called to cultivate the martial courage proper to men, there are other types of courage necessary to women.  “Certainly courage is opposed to fear.  But there is more than one kind of fear.  It is not necessary for us to cultivate the courage that makes someone go to war or be willing to risk his life.”  It is precisely the pupils and alumnae of Saint-Cyr who illustrate the type of courage proper to women.  Courage within the school manifests itself in the diligence with which one executes the duties of the school day.  “There are those who joyfully fulfill all their duties and who are first in everything.  They love work, they want to please their teachers, and they want to do even more than one asks of them.”  Saint-Cyr alumnae express this gendered courage by enduring the constraints of the impoverished life of the provincial aristocracy.  Emily muses about “the poverty we may find in the future and the foul character of those with whom we will have to deal.  They very well might criticize without the moderation we are accustomed to here [at Saint-Cyr].”  Distinct from the courage of the warrior, the courage of women presents itself as the capacity to endure academic and domestic obstacles in the patient pursuit of one’s personal vocation as student or mistress of the manor.

Similarly, glory is redefined away from its traditionally masculine framework of military prowess or political preeminence.  For Maintenon, glory is a matter of personal integrity that could manifest itself as easily in domestic work as in military or political achievement.  The address On True Glory defines glory as a species of personal honor:  “I believe that true glory consists in loving one’s honor and in never performing any base action.”  Maintenonian glory is clearly gendered.  It not only includes the refusal of any major sin; it encompasses the refusal of typical female indiscretions, such as flirtation, receiving gifts from men, or accepting letters from men unknown to the addressee.  The address insists that glory is not a biological category, reposing on one’s familial descent; it is a type of integrity and self-reliance allied to hard work.  “There is much more nobility in living from one’s work and from one’s savings than in being a burden to one’s friends….I wouldn’t tell rich people to sell their needlework, but I would tell those who aren’t so rich to do so.”  Rather than being tied to distinguished public achievement, glory emerges as a simple preeminence in the practice of sacrificial virtues of service.  “We ordinarily recognize glory by its honesty and even by its humility, by its concern to give pleasure to others, to relieve pain, to avoid giving offense, and to render service.”  Freed from its traditional accoutrements of wealth, military valor, and social prominence, the redefined virtue of glory can now be cultivated as easily by impoverished women as it is by others.

In the dialogue On Eminence, Maintenon redefines the aristocratic virtue of eminence to include the experience of impoverished but industrious women.  The dialogue denies that eminence consists in social rank or economic fortune; on the contrary, authentic eminence consists in an unusual degree of self-mastery.  “True eminence consists in esteeming virtue alone, in knowing how to distance ourselves from fortune when it turns against us and how to avoid being intoxicated by fortune when it turns our way.  It consists in sharing the destiny of the unfortunate and in never holding them in contempt.”  In this fusion of neo-Stoic and Christian theories of virtue, eminence denotes both volitional equilibrium and sacrificial love of the suffering neighbor.  The dialogue also insists that authentic eminence must be acquired through personal merit and struggle, not conferred by family descent or inherited wealth.  “There are different types of nobility.  We have to see ourselves as we are.  We should only raise ourselves up through our own merit.  That is where we find true eminence.”  Paralleling her own controversial career in the French court, Maintenonian eminence subverts a social hierarchy of rank based on biological inheritance and exalts moral and social distinction acquired through tenacious personal endeavor.

d. Virtue and Class

Addressing an aristocratic public, Maintenon devotes particular attention to two virtues prized by court society: politeness and civility.

The address On Politeness insists on the central value of good manners to be cultivated by the pupils at Saint-Cyr.  “Since God has made you ladies by birth, have a lady’s manners.  May those of you who have been properly raised by your parents retain these manners and may the others soon acquire them.”  Maintenon details the components of noble comportment: refined language, upright posture, discreet gestures.  But Maintenon politeness does not limit itself to a code of external conduct; it is ultimately an interior disposition of respect toward all persons whom the mature aristocrat encounters: “Whatever you say or do, be careful to avoid giving offense or embarrassment to anyone.”  The purpose of external polite conduct is to express sensitivity toward the feelings and dignity of others.  Maintenon repeatedly reminds her pupils that this posture of reverence includes one’s servants and social inferiors as well as one’s peers and social superiors.

Complementing the virtue of politeness, the virtue of civility entails a spirit of sacrificial service toward all those with whom one interacts.  The address On Civility presents this virtue as an ascetical attention to the interests and needs of others.  “Civility involves freeing oneself in order to be busy about the needs of other people, in paying attention to what can help or hinder them, in order to do the former and to avoid the latter.  Civility entails not talking about oneself, not making others listen too long to oneself, listening carefully to others, avoiding making conversation focus on oneself and one’s tastes, and permitting the conversation to move naturally toward the accommodation of other people’s interests.”  Although civility includes the salon art of refined conversation, Maintenon presents the virtue as a refined species of humility, in which the concerns of others trump one’s own.

To clarify the nature of authentic civility, Maintenon appeals to the evangelical golden rule.  “The Gospel firmly accords with the duties of a civil life.  You know that Our Lord tells us that we should not do to others what we do not want others to do to us.  This must be our great rule, which does not rule out certain customs traditional in our native lands.”  Civility entails reciprocity, a recognition of the other persons one meets as one’s equal in dignity and in need.  Although On Civility admits that the fluctuating customs of a particular culture may require one to show special deference toward those considered socially superior, Maintenonian civility is built on an egalitarian ethics of mutual respect.

4. Reception and Interpretation

The immediate posthumous reputation of Madame de Maintenon was a largely negative one.  The memoirs of the courtier Louis de Rouvroy, duc de Saint-Simon (1675-1755), and the letters of Charlotte-Elisabeth of Bavaria, duchesse d’ Orléans (1652-1722), depicted Maintenon as a schemer who manipulated Louis XIV’s emotions of grief to achiever her power and then used that power to intensify the anti-Protestant policies of the throne.  The publication of Maintenon’s alleged letters (1752) by the Huguenot writer Laurent Angliviel de La Beaumelle presented Maintenon as the hidden architect of Louis XIV’s Revocation of the Edict of Nantes and other persecutory measures.  Subsequent discovery of the forged nature of the most incriminating letters in La Beaumelle’s collection did little to soften the image of Maintenon as a manipulative bigot, an image still present in Patricia Mazuy’s film Saint-Cyr (2000).

In the nineteenth-century, Théophile Lavallée’s multi-volume edition of the works of Maintenon (1854-66) presented the breadth and complexity of Maintenon’s extensive writings.  Commentators began to note Maintenon’s skill as a moraliste, an analyst of the conflicting interplay of virtue and vice in the human constitution.  In the late nineteenth-century, educational officials of the French Third Republic attempted to foster public high school education for women through the new institution of the lycée. Maintenon’s addresses and dialogues seemed perfectly suited for an adolescent female public cultivating the virtues necessary for citizenship.  The anthologies of Maintenon’s texts assembled by Cadet (1885), Faguet (1885), Geoffroy (1887), and Jacquinet (1888) were textbooks designed for the new lycée.  But these anthologies presented an oddly areligious Maintenon, carefully denatured by the anti-clerical Third Republic.  References to God, religion, and piety were often censored out of her texts; only the more secular virtues survived.

Recent studies of Maintenon have attempted to present a more positive evaluation of Maintenon as a philosopher.  Madeleine Daniélou’s study of Maintenon’s educational theories and practices (1948) underscores her innovations as an educational philosopher and the theological foundations of that philosophy.  John Conley’s English translation of and commentary on Maintenon (2004) describes the complexity of her moral psychology, especially in her account of virtue and freedom.  Other commentators, however, notably Carolyn Lougee (1976) and Carlo François (1987), lament that Maintenon’s educational experiments and theories still confined women to the spheres of the household and of the convent.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations were made by the author of this article.

  1. Primary Sources
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon. Conseils et instructions aux demoiselles pour leur conduite dans le monde. Ed. Théophile Lavallée. 2 vols. Paris: Charpentier, 1857.
    • [Still the standard edition of the major works of Maintenon composed for pupils at Saint-Cyr.]
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon . Lettres et entretiens sur l’éducation des filles. Ed. Théophile Lavallée. 2 vols. Paris: Charpentier, 1854.
    • [A collection of letters and addresses dealing with issues of education.]
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon. Extraits de ses Lettres, Avis, Entretiens, Conversations et Proverbes. 4th ed. Ed. Octave Gréard. Paris: Hachette, 1886.
    • [This anthology of Maintenon’s texts is available online at Gallica, bibliothéque numérique, on the website of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.]
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon. Comment la sagesse vient aux filles. Eds. Pierre-E. Leroy and Marcel Loyau.  Etrepilly: Batrillat, 1998.
    • [Extensive contemporary anthology of Maintenon texts dealing with education.]
  • Maintenon, Françoise d’Aubigné, marquise de Maintenon. Dialogues and Addresses. Trans. and ed. John Conley. Other Voice Series. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2004.
    • [Contemporary English translation of Maintenon’s major educational texts, accompanied by philosophical commentary.]
  1. Secondary Sources
  • Castelot, André. Madame de Maintenon: La reine secrète. Paris: Perrin, 1996.
    • [A sympathetic study of the political role of Maintenon.]
  • Conley, John. The Suspicion of Virtue: Women Philosophers in Neoclassical France. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2002. pp. 124-56.
    • [A philosophical analysis of Maintenon’s educational and moral theories.]
  • Daniélou, Madeleine. Madame de Maintenon, éducatrice. Paris: Bloud & Gay, 1946.
    • [A sympathetic rehabilitation of the educational philosophy and theology of Maintenon.]
  • François, Carlo. Précieuses et autres indociles: Aspects du féminisme dans la littérature française du XVIIe siècle. Birmingham, AL: Summa Publications, 1987.
    • [A critical treatment of Maintenon’s work as antifeminist.]
  • Le Nabour, Eric. La Porteuse d’ombre: Madame de Maintenon et le Roi-Soleil. Paris: Tallandier, 1999.
    • [A biography focusing on the role of Maintenon in the court politics at Versailles.]
  • Lougee, Carolyn. Le paradis des femmes: Women, Salons, and Social Stratification in Seventeenth-Century France. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1976.
    • [A critical study of Maintenon’s school at Saint-Cyr compared with other period experiments in education of women.]

Author information

John J. Conley
Loyola University of Maryland

Nicolas Malebranche: Religion

MalebrancheNicolas Malebranche (1638-1715) was a French philosopher and a rationalist in the Cartesian tradition. But he was also an Oratorian priest in the Catholic Church. Religious themes pervade his works, and in several places he clearly affirms his intention to write philosophy as a Catholic. These religious themes are important for understanding his philosophy. As a rationalist, Malebranche places great emphasis on the importance of Reason. However, because he identifies Reason with the Divine Word, that is, with the Son or Second Person of the Trinity, his rationalism has features that are not common among other forms of rationalism. For example, Reason is a divine person and therefore capable of a wide range of action. In tracing out some of the consequences of this identification of Reason with the Divine Word, the student of Malebranche is quickly immersed in a wide range of his favorite theological and philosophical ideas. The present article will explore three theological ideas which play a special role in Malebranche’s philosophical thought: the Trinity, Original Sin, and the Incarnation.

Table of Contents

  1. A Trinitarian Account of Reason
  2. Love and Order
  3. Original Sin
  4. Universal Reason as External Teacher
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Reference Format
    2. Further Reading

1. A Trinitarian Account of Reason

The features of the doctrine of the Trinity that are of the greatest importance for understanding Malebranche’s philosophical views are the following:

(1) There are three persons of the Godhead, usually known as the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit. Malebranche, however, follows the opening verses of the Gospel of John, which calls the Son the Logos. The usual translation of this into English is ‘Word,’ but it can also be translated as ‘Reason,’ and this is how Malebranche understands it. Likewise, Malebranche preferred the Augustinian tradition of giving the name ‘Love’ to the Holy Spirit.

(2) The three persons are consubstantial and coeternal; that is, they are not three distinct Gods but one God and are inseparable. (3) Human beings are created in some way in the image of God, so that there is a sort of analogy, however loose, indirect, or approximate, between the human mind and the Trinity.

The influence of these ideas is recognizable in Malebranche’s account of ideas. Rather than holding ideas to be innate, Malebranche claims that they are found in God. In fact, he identifies them with divine ideas in the traditional theological sense. Theologians attributed ideas to God by drawing an analogy to artistic design. Just as the artisan who makes a product knows his product independently of that product’s actual existence, since the product’s actual existence presupposes the plan or idea by which the artisan makes it in the first place, so God knows His creation by means of productive ideas. Since these ideas cannot be something independent of God Himself, they are simply the divine substance itself insofar as God’s perfections are participable or imitable by creatures: each creature in its own limited way imitates or ‘partitions’ the infinite unlimited perfection of God. By knowing His own unlimited perfection, then, God knows all things He could possibly make, and thus all things that could possibly come to exist. It is this conception of ideas that makes up the primary background for Malebranche’s account of ideas and, pressed by critics, Malebranche through the course of his career placed greater and greater emphasis on this element of his thought that derived from tradition. Malebranche’s place in this tradition is most explicitly developed in the 1696 Preface to the Dialogues, where he quotes a number of passages from Augustine and Thomas Aquinas in order to extract a general description of divine ideas, which he then directly applies to ideas in his account.

Malebranche goes farther than this, into territory that might well have made traditional theologians uncomfortable. Ideas are not merely in God in the sense that they are the divine substance understood in a certain way; they are somehow a manifestation of God’s Reason, which is “coeternal and consubstantial with Him” (LO 614; OC 3:131). The use of the term “consubstantial,” a traditional theological term applied to the Word or Son, that is, the second Person of the Trinity, marks out the direction in which the Oratorian wants to take this line of reasoning. Drawing on, and modifying, the Augustinian tradition, Malebranche suggests that a proper account of the reason to which we regularly appeal must be rooted in the Christian doctrine of the Trinity. God’s Reason is the Word, and we are rational because the Word, the Logos, is our Interior Teacher (an Augustinian phrase). When we attend to various ideas we are learning from the Divine Word, universal Reason; thus Malebranche’s thesis that all things are seen in God is a way of putting the Word at the center of epistemology. Ideas are the province of the second Person of the Trinity; to attribute ideas to ourselves is to commit the serious mistake of attributing to ourselves what only belongs to God. It is to fail to see (to use another Augustinian phrase that is one of the Oratorian’s favorite sayings) that we are not our own light. This Trinitarian move is the foundation for Malebranche’s version of rationalism; Reason is infallible because Reason is quite literally God.

In a Trinitarian account of Reason there is necessarily more to Reason than an account of our rational ideas can cover on its own. As the Interior Teacher, Reason not only illuminates us with ideas, but also guides us in inquiry through interior sentiments, particularly pleasures and pains. Some background explaining Malebranche’s view of the role of freedom in inquiry will help to clarify this unusual twist in his epistemology.

The understanding is “that passive faculty of the soul by means of which it receives all the modifications of which it is capable” (LO 3; OC 1:43). On the other hand, the will is “the impression or natural impulse that carries us toward general and indeterminate good” (LO 5; OC 1:46). The will is both active, although Malebranche is careful to qualify this by the phrase “in a sense” (LO 4; OC 1:46), and free, where freedom is “the force that the mind has of turning this impression toward objects that please us, and making it so that our natural inclinations are directed to some particular object” (OC 1:46; cf. LO 5). When we believe something necessary, it is because “there is in these things no further relation to be considered that the understanding has not already perceived” (LO 9; OC 1:53). We need freedom because there are many cases in which this has not yet occurred, requiring us to direct our attention (another act of the will) in other directions, and, more importantly, because everything the intellect receives has some appearance of truth (we seem to perceive it, after all), so “if the will were not free and if it were infallibly and necessarily led to everything having the appearance of truth and goodness, it would almost always be deceived” (LO 10; OC 1:54). At first glance, this would force us to say that God, as Author of our natures, is the source of our errors. To avoid this premise, Malebranche concludes that God gives us freedom in order that we may under these circumstances avoid falling into error. In particular, we are given freedom so that we may refrain from accepting the merely probable, by continuing to investigate “until everything to be investigated is unraveled and brought to light” (LO 10; OC 1:54).

Therefore, we have an epistemic duty to use our freedom as much as we can, as long as we do not use it to avoid yielding to “the clear and distinct perception of all the constituents and relations of the object necessary to support a well-founded judgment” (LO 10; OC 1:55). How do we know we have reached clear and distinct perception? Malebranche does not appeal to anything intrinsic to the clear and distinct perception itself. Rather, he suggests that we know it through the “inward reproaches of our reason” (LO 10; OC 1:55), “the powerful voice of the Author of Nature,” which he also calls “the reproaches of our reason and the remorse of our conscience” (LO 11; OC 1:57). That is, we know we clearly and distinctly perceive something because when we try to doubt the perception, Reason reproaches us with pangs of intellectual conscience. In addition to these pangs of intellectual conscience, we are led by “a certain inward conviction” and “the impulses felt while meditating” (LO 13; OC 1:60).

It is in the context of discussing these sentiments, in fact, that Reason first appears in the main body of his major work, the Search after Truth, and, since similar sentiments about “the replies He gives to all those who know how to question Him properly” arise in the conclusion to the work, these epistemic sentiments may perhaps be said to frame the entire work. They play an important role in the Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion as well. We are told by the character Theodore early in the Dialogues that Reason guides inquiry by dispensing convictions and reproaches (JS 33; OC 12:194), and the point recurs throughout the Dialogues. Malebranche admits that distinguishing this guidance from prejudice can be difficult, but this is perhaps the point of the Search as a manual for avoiding error: by giving us rules and guidelines by which to avoid error, it helps us listen to the voice of Reason (cf. LO xlii-xliii, 529; OC 1:25-26, 2:453-454).

2. Love and Order

Malebranche extends this Trinitarian rationalism in order to give his own take on the claim that human minds are in the image of God, suggesting in the Treatise on Morals that our lives are structured by the Trinity itself:

The Father, to whom power is attributed, makes them to partake of His power, having established them as occasional causes of all the effects that they produce. The Son communicates His wisdom to them and discloses all truths to them through the direct union they have with the intelligible substance that He contains as universal Reason. The Holy Spirit animates them and sanctifies them through the invincible impression they have for the good, and through the charity or love of Order which He infuses into all hearts (OC 11:186; W 163).

This short passage on the way we are in the image of God gives a succinct summary of a number of claims that Malebranche regards as important; it also shows how intimately related to his Trinitarian concerns many of his most distinctive philosophical positions are. First, there is occasionalism, the view that only God is a true cause. Second, there is the union with universal Reason, according to which we are rational only by union with the Divine Word. Third, there is the will understood as the “invincible impression for the good,” which is attributed to the Holy Spirit.

The Holy Spirit is not invoked by Malebranche as often as the Father and the Son are, but there are several passages that hint at the Spirit’s importance; for example, in Elucidation Ten: “For since God cannot act without knowledge and in spite of Himself, He made the world according to wisdom and through the impulse of His love—He made all things through His Son and in the Holy Spirit as Scripture teaches” (OC 3:141; cf. LO 620). Despite receiving less emphasis, this third element, the theory of love that is associated with the Spirit as the theory of Reason is associated with the Son, plays an important role in the account of how we are related to Reason. Recognizing this requires recognizing Reason’s role in morality; Reason is (moral) Order.

The notion of Order is the core of Malebranche’s ethical theory, since "what makes a man righteous is that he loves order and that he conforms his will to it in all things; likewise the sinner is such only because order does not please him in everything and because he would rather have order conform to his own wishes" (OC 3:137; cf. LO 618). Order, in turn, is explained in Augustinian fashion in terms of the divine ideas. Having argued that ideas do not represent things equally noble or perfect, Malebranche goes on to explain the importance of this inequality:

If it is true, then, that God, who is the universal Being, contains all beings within Himself in an intelligible fashion, and that all these intelligible beings that have a necessary existence in God are not in every sense equally perfect, it is clear that there will be a necessary and immutable order among them, and that just as there are necessary and eternal truths because there are relations of magnitude among intelligible beings, there must also be a necessary and immutable order because of the relations of perfection among these same beings. An immutable order has it, then, that minds are more noble than bodies, as it is a necessary truth that twice two is four, or that twice two is not five (LO 618; OC 3:137-138).

We know ideas are not all equal because we judge the perfections of things by means of their ideas, and it is certain that things themselves are not all equal in perfection; some things are distinguished from others in that they have “more intelligence or mark of wisdom” (LO 618; OC 3:137). Because of this inequality, which is effectively an inequality in the moral salience of the things we know by way of ideas, the eternal, immutable intelligible world of ideas is also an eternal, immutable order. This order, however, is not a merely descriptive order. Were there nothing more to divine Order than the theory of ideas, it would be “more of a speculative truth than a necessary law” (LO 618; OC 3:138). Malebranche wants to go farther. This ordering of perfections among the divine ideas has a necessity that constrains even God. To take this system of divine ideas and make it “necessary law,” the Oratorian introduces his theory of love.

This theory, like the theory of ideas, is rooted in an understanding of the divine nature. Just as the theory of ideas is rooted in God as being in general, so the theory of love is rooted in God as good in general. God's goodness is a universal or sovereign goodness; God is "a good that contains all other goods within itself" (LO 269; OC 2:16). As such, God is the only perfect or completely adequate object for love, and, accordingly, God loves Himself perfectly. In loving Himself, He necessarily loves what in Himself represents Himself perfectly, namely, His own self-image, divine Wisdom or universal Reason, which contains the order of all things; and because of this, God always acts according to divine Order. The Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit are inseparable, and therefore God necessarily has a Love for Order. Malebranche goes so far as to say that "it is a contradiction that God should not love and will order" (LO 594; OC 3:97). It is because of this necessary love that order has a normative aspect; because of this love, order has "the force of law" for all minds (LO 620; OC 3:140), both created and uncreated.

Since God loves Himself, and in so doing operates according to Order, God creates us with an impulse to the most perfect good, namely Himself. This is our will. As Malebranche states,

Only because God loves Himself do we love anything, and if God did not love Himself, or if He did not continuously impress upon man's soul a love like His own, i.e., the impulse of love that we feel toward the good in general, we would love nothing, we would will nothing, and as a result, we would be without a will, since the will is only the impression of nature that leads us toward the good in general… (LO 337; OC 2:126-127)

Because order has the force of law, God makes us according to Order; part of this involves making us to love God alone as our sovereign good. This leaves us with the question of other goods besides God. Malebranche sometimes says that God loves only Himself (for example, LO 364; OC 2:169). However, this is never taken to mean that God does not love other things; in fact, "He loves all His works" (LO 330, 666; OC 2:113, 3:220). The reason is that, as sovereign good, God loves other things in loving Himself. As he notes, "God loves only Himself—He loves His creations only because they are related to His perfections, and He loves them to the extent to which they have this relation—in the final analysis God loves Himself and the things He has created with the same love" (LO 364; OC 2:169-170). On the other hand, not all things bear the same type of relation to Himself; there are, as we noted above, different relations of perfection in Order. Mind is more perfect than body; and, being more perfect, it is more closely related to God, and therefore more lovable. Because of this God cannot will that the mind be subordinated to the body. This is not a metaphysical or logical necessity, but an ethical necessity (an obligation) that presupposes the metaphysical necessity of divine self-love. Given that He loves Order, He ought to will the right ordering of perfections among creatures; this ‘ought’ is an obligation grounded in love.

God, in loving himself, loves sovereign Reason or Order and, because of this love, Order has normative force. When we see in Reason that the soul is more perfect than the body, for instance, we can recognize this principle as not merely a truth, but a law: “the living law of the Father” (JS 238; OC 12:302). Because it is according to Order that Order be loved, and since God always acts out of love of Order, and therefore always in conformity with it, God directs our own love toward Order. Moreover, the law of Order is sanctioned by divine omnipotence itself. Conformity with Order will, in the long run, be rewarded, while divergence from Order will be punished. In one key respect, however, Order is not like other laws. In a case of human law, we can evaluate a law, and perhaps reject it, by considering higher principles than those embodied in the law itself. Because it is the highest law, this can never be the case with Order; when we evaluate the goodness or rationality of any law, we can only do so by comparing it to Order. As divine, Order is the good in general; as Reason, Order is what makes anything rational. Order, in short, is authoritative in every significant way. This authority is essential to Malebranche’s discussion of human nature in its natural, 'prelapsarian' state, that is, its state prior to the Fall.

3. Original Sin

We know that God acts according to Order, and that, therefore, everything God creates is originally in conformity with Order. Because Reason shows us the divine ideas, we have cognitive access to Order, and therefore know the original, natural state of human beings (what God created human beings to be) despite not being in it ourselves:

But to speak accurately of innocent man, created in the image of God, we must consult the divine ideas of immutable order. It is there that we find the model of a perfect man such as our father was before his sin (JS 65; OC 12:103).

On this view, our natural state is nothing other than our ideal ethical state; we are most natural when we are perfect. What we find in “the model of the perfect man” is in some ways like us, but in some ways not. Like us, Adam in his original state was made in such a way as to be constituted by two relations, one to sensible goods and one to Reason. This twofold union, of mind to God and mind to body, looms large in Malebranche’s thought, and he sees it in terms borrowed from St. Augustine. Our union to God is what elevates us, and from it “the mind receives its life, its light, and its entire felicity”; however, our excessive attachment to our body “infinitely debases man and is today the main cause of all his errors and miseries” (LO xxxiii; OC 1:9). This intimate union of ethical, epistemological, metaphysical, and theological themes is characteristic of Malebranche’s thinking; a deviation from ethical perfection entails a corruption of nature and an obscuring of our cognitive abilities, and this deviation from ideal is nothing other than distraction from divine Reason.

However, if this is so, Adam (man as God originally created him) must differ from us in not being able to enjoy sensible goods in a way that ever conflicted with, or distracted from, the good of sovereign Reason. God works according to general laws, as Order requires, but as the general laws now stand, it is very easy for our union with bodies to interfere with our union with Reason. Therefore, there must have been some special characteristic in Adam’s situation that gave him greater control over his sensory union with the body. Because Adam was created to be subject only to God, he merited a special ability to maintain his relationship with divine Reason (JS 233; OC 12:296). Since God always acts according to Order, He cannot subject the mind to the body because this would violate Order by subjecting the more noble to the less noble. Malebranche interprets this to mean that something must have been in place to make it possible for Adam not to be distracted from Reason by bodies. In the Dialogues Theodore tells Aristes precisely what this something must have been:

And conclude from all this that prior to sin there were exceptions favoring human beings in the laws of the union of the soul and the body. Or, rather, conclude from it that there was a law which has been abolished, by which the human will was the occasional cause of that disposition of the brain by which the soul is shielded from the action of objects though the body is struck by them, and that thus despite this action it was never interrupted in its meditations and ecstasy. Do you not sense some vestige of this power in yourself when you are deeply absorbed in thought and the light of truth penetrates and delights you? (JS 65; OC 12:103)

When we look at what should be natural to us, and therefore what made our original state different from our current state, we may perhaps find it surprising that it involves a special ability to control our brains - an ability we now unnaturally lack. Although, intriguingly, Malebranche thinks we still have traces of it when we are “deeply absorbed in thought.”

Examination of ourselves in light of Reason, therefore, leads us to conclude that we are currently in a state of disorder. As Malebranche illustrates, alluding to the letter of Paul to the Romans, “each of us is sufficiently aware of a law in himself that captures and disorders him, a law not established by God because it is contrary to the immutable order of justice, which is the inviolable rule for all His volitions” (LO 580; OC 3:72). In practice, this disorder is an excessive concern with bodies, a concern so strong that it is a pathological dependence. We treat bodies, rather than God, as our true good of the mind. This makes us exalt our union with bodies over our union with Order, in the process running afoul, of course, of principles of Order (principles like “bodies are not worthy of love” and “all the love that God places in us must end in Him”). Given that this motion of love toward good is the will, and given that the will governs attention, we are driven to attend more to sensible matters than their ethical importance and value for inquiry would merit. While the senses are not corrupt in themselves, then, our excessive dependence on them is an essential feature of the corruption of our cognitive capacities. Malebranche regards these matters, at least at a very general level, as common knowledge.

For Malebranche, original sin is not purely a doctrine known on faith because it is something of which he thinks we can all be conscious of in ourselves, by comparing ourselves, known by interior sentiment, with Order, which is known clearly by ideas but obscurely by the interior sentiments it effects. In other words, we can recognize our disorder through moral principles or, more obscurely, through the feelings of conscience. Through faith we learn important details about this disorder, particularly about its history, some of which we could not otherwise know; the disorder itself, however, is something everyone can recognize. Reason teaches us that there is a way things should be; experience shows us that we are not the way we should be. What is more, experience seems also to suggest that the reason we are not the way we should be is not that we cannot be so, at least in any absolute sense. Malebranche does not develop the idea, but it seems suggested by Theodore’s statement in the Dialogues that we can still experience “some vestige of this power” (JS 65; OC 12:102). In general our minds are clouded and confused, but on rare occasions, we go beyond this.

Furthermore, because it affects the way we interact with sensible goods, the disorder of original sin has serious epistemic consequences. In particular, “the mind constantly spreads itself externally; it forgets itself and Him who enlightens and penetrates it, and it lets itself be so seduced by its body and by those surrounding it that it imagines finding in them its perfection and happiness” (LO 657; OC 3:203). Our primary union is with sovereign Reason, but distracted by our union with sensible things, we treat this latter union as if it were more important; and because “we cannot increase our union with sensible things without diminishing our union with intelligible truths” (LO 415; OC 2:257), we ignore our union with universal Reason to the extent we devote our attention to sensible things. The reason, Malebranche thinks, is that we enjoy making judgments, and therefore try to have this pleasure without first consulting Reason (LO 649; OC 3:189). This trait bodes ill for us if we are interested in avoiding error, as we shall see. For now what is interesting is just how sharply this error-inducing dependence on the body differentiates human nature in its original and ideal state from human nature as we currently find it. There is a sort of inevitability about some aspects of our dependence on the body. Our ideas are clouded, our attention becomes tired (JS 65; OC 12:103), and in practice there is little we can do about this. Malebranche is clear that this was not the case with Adam, due to the special power over the body we have already noted, a power that we (at least beyond a certain degree) conspicuously lack.

Since we have lost the ability to govern our brains properly because its presence in us was linked by principles of Order to our merit, we now must struggle to overcome disturbances Adam in Eden would easily have overcome. There is a sense in which this has been a fall from intelligence, since our thought is now subject to our body’s limitations and thus we are naturally inclined to make stupid mistakes. Prior to sin, Adam was not stupid enough to think that bodies were the real cause of his pleasure (LO 593; OC 3:96). We, however, have become that stupid. This is the root of Malebranche’s diagnosis of the psychological basis for the claim that bodies are true causes, a claim he considers to be the most dangerous philosophical error original sin has spawned. This brings us immediately to the motivation for Malebranche’s occasionalism, his view that God alone is a true cause.

For Malebranche, a pagan worldview follows closely on, and is perhaps the primary consequence of, original sin. It is this recognition that mediates between his arguments against necessary connection and his general views; it is by means of their ethical role, as correctives to the presumptions of the pagan mindset, that the arguments interest him; see Gouhier’s excellent discussion (1926, pp. 108-114). Gouhier’s phrase for this pagan worldview, la philosophie du serpent, the philosophy of the serpent, captures Malebranche’s view perfectly. Occasionalism is an ethical antidote, or at least an ethical treatment, for our tendency to idolatry, and, in particular, for an especially pernicious instance of this idolatry:

If the nature of pagan philosophy is a chimera, if this nature is nothing, we must be advised of it, for there are many people who are mistaken with respect to it. There are more than we might think who thoughtlessly attribute to it the works of God, who busy themselves with this idol or fiction of the human mind, and who render to it the honor due only to the Divinity. (LO 668; OC 3:223-224)

The philosophical superstition of causal powers or efficacious natures is but one more sad example of the terrible failure of human nature to live up to the demands of Order; it is but one more expression of the “secret opposition between God and man” (LO 657; OC 3:204). It has its root in a religious failing, the failure to give God the credit He is due.

4. Universal Reason as External Teacher

Even though original sin puts our cognitive capacities in a wretched state, Malebranche does not throw up his hands in despair, nor does he resort to skepticism. The reasons for Malebranche’s optimism all have to do with the active and personal role played by universal Reason in human life. Without his personal role of sovereign Reason, despair and skepticism would be unavoidable. With it, Malebranche can afford to be optimistic.

The first reason for Malebranche’s optimism is that we are never entirely cut off from the teaching of Reason. However, much of our perverse fascination with bodily goods may obscure the guidance, yet Reason still guides us. Not only does Reason still illuminate us with ideas, He “teaches us inwardly” when we take the trouble to engage in philosophical meditation (LO 13; OC 1:61). Reason still encourages, warns, and rebukes us as our intellectual conscience. Although prejudices resulting from original sin have made it difficult to find truth, knowledge is still possible.

The second reason that Malebranche can be optimistic is that Reason has not been idle in the face of our perversity. This is seen most clearly in the Incarnation. In more secularly-minded times this may be the hardest bit of Malebranche’s system to wrap one’s mind around; even someone willing to allow Reason an active role in guiding inquiry might balk at taking the Incarnation as an essential part of epistemology. It is not, however, an ad hoc addition to the Oratorian’s other claims. It would, indeed, be rather strange if he did not think along these lines, given other claims he makes. Reason is the second Person of the Trinity, the Logos or divine Word; the Word is, in the opening words of the gospel of John, the light of all who come into the world, and also is the Word made flesh. It is Reason that we consult in inquiry; Reason illuminates us with ideas, judges our actions, rebukes us for bad uses of freedom and rewards us for good. Given all this, it is not surprising that Reason takes an active and personal hand in fixing the epistemological and ethical mess in which fallen humanity finds itself; Malebranche has already insisted that Reason takes an active and personal hand in a number of epistemological and ethical areas.

In the Incarnation, therefore, the divine Word has resorted to a new method of teaching in its attempt to counteract our fallen condition:

The Son of God, who is the wisdom of God or eternal truth, was made man and became sensible to make Himself known to crude and carnal men. He wished to instruct them by means of what was blinding them; He wished to lead them to His love, to free them from sensible goods by means of the same things that were enslaving them. Dealing with fools, He used a kind of foolishness to make them wise (LO 367; OC 2:124. Cf. also LO 417-418; OC 2:260-261).

The divine Word took physical form because human beings have an excessive love for sensory things. According to Malebranche, this teaches us several things. First, in our own teaching we should invest intelligible truth with the sort of presentation that would in some way appeal to the senses. This can be overdone, of course. It is being done correctly only when it elevates us to the intelligible rather than flattering the senses, or, more specifically, when it causes people to withdraw inward in order to think and meditate rather than outward in order to be entertained by sensible things (cf. LO 418; OC 2:261).

Malebranche also contemplates about Wisdom becoming sensible “in order to condemn and sacrifice in its person all sensible things.” He does not elaborate much on this phrase, but the Preface to the Search makes it clear enough. He claims that one of the lessons the Incarnation is meant to teach us is “the scorn we should have for all objects of the senses” (LO xxxviii; OC 1:18). By uniting Himself with a body, he exalted to the highest dignity anything could have, namely, union with God; it became “the most estimable of sensible things.” This “most estimable of sensible things,” however, was subjugated to divine truth to the point of suffering and death. The idea is that if even the most estimable sensible thing should be held less important than truth and order, than all sensible things should be regarded as less important than truth and order. From this Malebranche concludes that “we must gradually become accustomed to disbelieving the reports our senses make about all the bodies surrounding us, which they always portray as worthy of our application and respect.” As he asks rhetorically in Treatise on Nature and Grace, “did not Jesus Christ sacrifice and destroy, in his person, all grandeurs and sensible pleasures? Has not his life been for us a continual example of humility and of penitence?” (R 131-132; OC 5:53). In effect, Malebranche advocates others to take Jesus Christ as an epistemological model. It is perhaps not common to appeal to epistemological rather than ethical exemplars, but in Malebranche’s philosophy epistemology and ethics are closely related. In fact, there are passages that suggest that he considers them to be essentially the same thing. Consider, for example, the following passage, which opens

Error is the cause of men’s misery; it is the sinister principle that has produced the evil in the world; it generates and maintains in our soul all the evils that afflict us, and we may hope for sound and genuine happiness only by seriously laboring to avoid it (LO 1; OC 1:39).

The error here is both intellectual and moral. That it is both appears to be necessitated by the role of the will. Every error is a misuse of will contrary to the guidance of Reason, and therefore can be treated as an immoral rebellion against Reason (cf. LO 8-11; OC1:50-54). Since the Incarnation involves the perfect union of body, mind, and divine Word, the incarnate Word is a paradigm case of perfect orderly relation among the three, and therefore in itself serves as part of Reason’s pedagogy, as “the rule of beauty and of perfection” (R 123; OC 5:41) against which we must measure ourselves.

The third way in which Malebranche thinks the incarnate Word extends its work of teaching the human race is the most obvious, through explicit moral teaching, which communicates to us “in a sensible, palpable way the eternal commands of the divine law,” so as to reinforce its too-often-ignored inner promptings (JS 81; OC 3:121). Related to this, Malebranche considers the teaching of the Church to be one form that Reason’s teaching takes. That is, the Church is “a visible authority emanating from incarnate Wisdom,” extending that moral teaching through time (JS 81; OC 3:121). This is in part necessary because Reason is interested in teaching “the poor, the simple, the ignorant, and those who cannot read,” not merely “those who have enough life, as well as mind and knowledge, to discern truth from error” (JS 255-256; OC 12:322-323). Reason’s exercise of visible teaching authority has not ceased, but rather continues in the Church, which continues Reason’s work of compensating for human failings.

It is unsurprising, then, that Malebranche attacks the Protestant notion of sola scriptura as not merely theologically problematic but also philosophically irrational. Even if the author of the Gospel of Matthew were the apostle, and even if we can suppose there was no corruption in the transmission of the text, we cannot base our faith on the words we read there unless we have an infallible authority teaching that the evangelist was inspired by God. The only infallible authority is God Himself, so the Holy Spirit must either reveal the inspiration of Scripture to each person individually or to the church as a trust for all; of this choice, Malebranche says, “the latter is much more simple, more general, more worthy of providence than the former” (JS 256; OC 12:323). Even if we granted that God revealed to each individual that the text was inspired, Malebranche thinks that this is far from adequate; after you recognize the text as inspired you still must come to understand it. Since God wills for all people to arrive at knowledge of the truth, there must be something to help lead us to it, and again the choice is between inspiration of each person individually or the church collectively. But, states Malebranche, it is absurd to attribute to each individual person the divine assistance one denies to the entire church in assembly, given that the church preserves tradition and, more than any individual, deserves that Jesus Christ guarantee its protection. Jesus imitates the Father as much as is possible; therefore “He will never act in a certain person in a particular manner without some particular reason, without some kind of necessity” (JS 258; OC 12:325). Since it is generally sufficient for Christ to preserve the faithful by preserving the Church’s authority and infallibility in matters of faith, it is absurd and presumptuous to expect special enlightenment by reading Scripture on one’s own, just as it is absurd and presumptuous to expect God to make exceptions to natural laws for one’s personal convenience.

The existence of a church or divine society (with authority, scripture, teaching, and rituals) makes it possible for Reason to do the most good to the most people in the simplest way, preparing for the restoration even of those who do not have the leisure or ability to do rigorous philosophical meditation (JS 257-258; OC 12:323-324). The graces of enlightenment and sentiment (R 151; OC 5:97) extend the dual teaching function of Reason discussed previously, namely, enlightenment by ideas and guidance by sentiments. These graces form and guide the Church, making certain aspects of its teaching, for example, preaching on the basis of Scripture, an infallible authority on whose basis arguments almost like demonstrations can be formed. In Malebranche’s view, Reason is therefore the foundation for the infallibility of the Catholic Church in matters of faith and morals. He was quite right in saying that his philosophy was a Catholic philosophy.

5. Conclusion

There are a number of ways in which Malebranche’s religious interests affect his philosophical discussion.

(1) Reason has the features of the Second Person of the Trinity, that is, the Son or Word of God. Reason is a divine person. This allows Malebranche to attribute a wider range of activities to Reason than could be attributed to an impersonal reason.

(2) The Trinitarian influence helps to clarify why Malebranche has no problem with talking as if Reason, in its aspect of Order, constrained even God: he has a Trinitarian account of why God must act according to Order.

(3) Original sin plays an extraordinarily important role in Malebranche’s philosophy, to such an extent that even Malebranche’s discussion of very philosophical topics, like the question of whether there are causal powers, is affected by his understanding of original sin and its tendency to drag us away from attentive meditation on divine ideas in Reason.

(4) There is no question that Malebranche’s philosophy is Catholic throughout. Purely Catholic themes and ideas arise throughout, to such an extent that he does not hesitate to bring Catholic doctrines about the Incarnation or the Church into his philosophical discussions.

These are only a few examples. There are many other ways in which Malebranche’s religious views and practices are reflected in his philosophy: his discussions of grace and providence, his theodicy, his relation to the French School of Spirituality founded by Bérulle, and more. Many of these have only just begun to be studied in any detail. If, however, we were to examine every way in which Malebranche’s philosophy were influenced by his religious views, this would not be any different from a complete examination of every facet of his philosophy.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Reference Format

In this article the following reference format for Malebranche’s works has been used:

(LO 418; OC 2:261; cf. also R 131-132; OC 5:53)

The English translation is given first, with its page number; followed by ‘OC’ to indicate the standard French edition, the Oeuvres Complètes, with the volume and page number; particularly notable analogous references follow the “cf. also.” At times, when reference is intended to two different passages equally, the following format has been used:

(LO 330, 666; OC 2:113, 3:220)

The English translations are listed first, while their corresponding pages in the Oeuvres Complètes are listed in order after the semicolon. Thus “OC 2:113” corresponds to “LO 330” and “OC 3:220” corresponds to “LO 666.” Where the passage as quoted in the article deviates from the English translation, this is noted by the following format:

(OC 12:196; cf. JS 147)

The edition abbreviations that have been used are:

JS: Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion, Nicholas Jolley and David Scott, eds. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.

LO: The Search after Truth, Thomas Lennon and Paul Olscamp, eds. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.

OC: Oeuvres Complètes de Malebranche, 20 vols., André Robinet, ed. Paris: J. Vrin, 1958-84.

R: Treatise on Nature and Grace, Patrick Riley, ed. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.

W: Treatise on Ethics, Craig Walton, ed. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1993.

Current scholarship on the role of religion in Malebranche’s philosophy is fairly limited, and what exists is somewhat uneven. The following are suggested as useful for those who wish to study this topic. Some of them discuss the matter in its own right, while others simply raise important questions and topics for further investigation in the course of discussing other things.

b. Further Reading

  • Arnauld, Antoine. On True and False Ideas, Elmar Kremer, ed. Lewiston: Edwin Mellen Press, 1990. This important work, occasioned by Malebranche’s views on grace, began the long-lasting dispute between Arnauld and Malebranche.
  • Astell, Mary, and Norris, John. Letters Concerning the Love of God, E. Derek Taylor and Melvyn New, eds. London: Ashgate, 2005. John Norris was a British Malebranchean; his correspondence with Mary Astell is an excellent resource for identifying features of Malebranche’s thought that would have been considered especially relevant to religion in the period.
  • Connell, Desmond. The Vision in God: Malebranche’s Scholastic Sources, Paris: Nauwelaerts, 1967. Connell’s book, despite its relatively limited topic, is a good beginning for those interested in looking at the question of how Malebranche’s thought relates to the broader context of Catholic thought out of which it emerges.
  • Gouhier, Henri. La philosophie de Malebranche et son expérience religieuse, 2nd ed., Paris: J. Vrin, 1948.
  • Gouhier, Henri. La vocation de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin, 1926. This and the immediately preceding work are still the must-read texts for any study of the relation between Malebranche’s religion and his philosophy.
  • Guéroult, Martial. Malebranche, 3 vols. Paris: Aubier, 1955-59. This rather extensive work discusses a number of religion-related issues in Malebranche, and has some particularly notable discussions of Malebranche’s Augustinianism.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. The Light of the Soul: Theories of Ideas in Leibniz, Malebranche, and Descartes. In the course of his discussion of theories of ideas Jolley raises a number of key questions that have to be considered by anyone interested in the relation between religion and philosophy in Malebranche.
  • Nadler, Steven. Arnauld and the Cartesian Philosophy of Ideas, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989. Among other things, Nadler considers the important question of why Arnauld chose to begin his attack on the Treatise on Nature and Grace with a criticism of the philosophy of the Search after Truth.
  • Radner, Ephraim. Spirit and Nature: A Study of 17th Century Jansenism, New York: Crossroad, 2002. Radner is mostly concerned with the theological controversies over Jansenist appellants, but the dispute between Arnauld and Malebranche is treated as important background to this religious question.
  • Reid, Jasper. “Malebranche on Intelligible Extension,” British Journal of the History of Philosophy 11:4 (2003), 581-608. An excellent demonstration of how considering Malebranche’s theological interests can clarify puzzles arising elsewhere in his philosophy.
  • Robinet, André. Système et existence dans l’oeuvre de Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin, 1965. This work contains good, albeit occasionally short, discussions of various religious issues in Malebranche’s works (notably original sin).
  • Schmaltz, Tad. Malebranche’s Theory of the Soul: A Cartesian Interpretation. New York: Oxford University Press, 1996. This work only obliquely discusses matters relevant to religious themes in Malebranche’s philosophy, but it is currently the best discussion of the diverse roles Malebranche attributes to sentiment.

Author Information

Brandon Watson
Austin Community College
U. S. A.

Joseph Butler (1692—1752)

butlerBishop Joseph Butler is a well-known religious philosopher of the eighteenth century. He is still read and discussed among contemporary philosophers, especially for arguments against some major figures in the history of philosophy, such as Thomas Hobbes and John Locke. In his Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel (1729), Butler argues against Hobbes's egoism, and in the Analogy of Religion (1736), he argues against Locke's memory-based theory of personal identity.

Overall, Butler's philosophy is largely defensive. His general strategy is to accept the received systems of morality and religion and, then, defend them against those who think that such systems can be refuted or disregarded. Butler ultimately attempts to naturalize morality and religion, though not in an overly reductive way, by showing that they are essential components of nature and common life. He argues that nature is a moral system to which humans are adapted via conscience. Thus, in denying morality, Butler takes his opponents to be denying our very nature, which is untenable. Given this conception of nature as a moral system and certain proofs of God's existence, Butler is then in a position to defend religion by addressing objections to it, such as the problem of evil.

This article provides an overview of Butler's life, works, and influence with special attention paid to his writings on religion and ethics. The totality of his work addresses the questions: Why be moral? Why be religious? Which morality? Which religion? In attempting to answer such questions, Butler develops a philosophy that possesses a unity often neglected by those who read him selectively. The philosophy that develops is one according to which religion and morality are grounded in the natural world order.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Human Nature as Made for Virtue
  3. Human Life as in the Presence of God
  4. This Life as a Prelude to a Future Life
  5. The World as a Moral Order
  6. The Christian Scriptures as a Revelation
  7. Public Institutions as Moral Agents
  8. Butler's Influence
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Butler
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Joseph Butler was born into a Presbyterian family at Wantage. He attended a dissenting academy, but then converted to the Church of England intent on an ecclesiastical career. Butler expressed distaste for Oxford's intellectual conventions while a student at Oriel College; he preferred the newer styles of thought, especially those of John Locke, the 3rd Earl of Shaftesbury and Francis Hutcheson, leading David Hume to characterize Butler as one of those "who have begun to put the science of man on a new footing, and have engaged the attention, and excited the curiosity of the public." Butler benefited from the support of Samuel Clarke and the Talbot family.

In 1719, Butler was appointed to his first job, preacher to the Rolls Chapel in Chancery Lane, London. Butler's anonymous letters to Clarke had been published in 1716, but a selection of his Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel (1729) was the first work published under his name. The Rolls sermons are still widely read and have held the attention of secular philosophers more than any other sermons in history. Butler moved north and became rector of Stanhope in 1725. Only at this point is his life documented in any detail, and his tenure is remembered mainly for the Analogy of Religion (1736). Soon after publication of that work, Butler became Bishop of Bristol. Queen Caroline had died urging his preferment, but Bristol was one of the poorest sees, and Butler expressed some displeasure in accepting it. Once Butler became dean of St. Paul's in 1740, he was able to use that income to support his work in Bristol. In 1750, not long before his death, Butler was elevated to Durham, one of the richest bishoprics. The tradition that Butler declined the See of Canterbury was conclusively discredited by Norman Sykes (1936), but continues to be repeated uncritically in many reference works. Butler's famous encounter with John Wesley has only recently been reconstructed in as full detail as seems possible given the state of the surviving evidence, and we are now left with little hope of ever knowing what their actual relationship was. They disagreed, certainly, on Wesley's right to preach without a license, and on this point Butler seems entirely in the right; but Butler may have supported Wesley more than he opposed him, and Wesley seems entirely sincere in his praise of the Analogy.

Butler has become an icon of a highly intellectualized, even rarefied, theology, "wafted in a cloud of metaphysics," as Horace Walpole said. Ironically, Butler refused as a matter of principle to write speculative works or to pursue curiosity. All his writings were directly related to the performance of his duties at the time or to career advancement. From the Rolls sermons on, all his works are devoted to pastoral philosophy.

A pastoral philosopher gives philosophically persuasive arguments for seeing life in a particular way when such a seeing-as may have a decisive effect on practice. Butler had little interest in, and only occasionally practiced, natural theology in the scholastic sense; his intent is rather defensive: to answer those who claim that morals and religion, as conventionally understood, may be safely disregarded. Butler tried to show, as a refutation of the practice of his day (as he perceived it), that morals and religion are natural extensions of the common way of life usually taken for granted, and thus that those who would dispense with them bear a burden of proof they are unable to discharge. In arguing that morals and religion are favored by a presumption already acknowledged in ordinary life, Butler employs many types of appeal, at least some of which would be fallacious if used in an attempted demonstrative argument.

2. Human Nature as Made for Virtue

Butler's argument for morality, found primarily in his sermons, is an attempt to show that morality is a matter of following human nature. To develop this argument, he introduces the notions of nature and of a system. There are, he says, various parts to human nature, and they are arranged hierarchically. The fact that human nature is hierarchically ordered is not what makes us manifestly adapted to virtue, rather, it is what Butler calls "conscience" that is at the top of this hierarchy. Butler does sometimes refer to the conscience as the voice of God; but, contrary to what is sometimes alleged, he never relies on divine authority in asserting the supremacy, the universality or the reliability of conscience. Butler clearly believes in the autonomy of the conscience as a secular organ of knowledge.

Whether the conscience judges principles, actions or persons is not clear, perhaps deliberately since such distinctions are of no practical significance. What Butler is concerned to show is that to dismiss morality is in effect to dismiss our own nature, and therefore absurd. As to which morality we are to follow, Butler seems to have in mind the common core of civilized standards. He stresses the degree of agreement and reliability of conscience without denying some differences remain. All that is required for his argument to go through is that the opponent accept in practice that conscience is the supreme authority in human nature and that we ought not to disregard our own nature.

The most significant recent challenge to Butler's moral theory is by Nicholas Sturgeon (1976), a reply to which appears in Stephen Darwall (1995).

Besides the appeal to the rank of conscience, Butler offered many other observations in his attempt to show that we are made for (that is, especially suited to) virtue. In a famous attack on the egoistic philosophy of Thomas Hobbes, he argues that benevolence is as much a part of human nature as self-love. Butler also argues that various other aspects of human nature are adapted to virtue, sometimes in surprising ways. For example, he argues that resentment is needed to balance benevolence. He also deals forthrightly with self-deception.

Only three of the fifteen sermons deal with explicitly religious themes: the sermons on the love of God and the sermon on ignorance.

3. Human Life as in the Presence of God

Butler's views on our knowledge of God are among the most frequently misstated aspects of his philosophy. Lewis White Beck's exposition (1937) of this neglected aspect of Butler's philosophy has itself been generally neglected, and both friends and foes frequently assert that Butler "assumed" that God exists. Butler never assumes the existence of God; rather, at least after his exchange with Clarke, he takes it as granted that God's existence can be and has been proved to the satisfaction of those who were party to the discussion in his time. The charge, frequently repeated since the mid-nineteenth century, that Butler's position is reversible once an opponent refuses to grant God's existence, is therefore groundless. It is true that Butler does not expound any proof of God's existence. (Notice that this fact makes it problematic to identify him with the character Cleanthes in Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion.) However, he does endorse many such proofs, using common names rather than citing specific texts.

The sermons on the love of God are rarely read today, but they provide abundant evidence that Butler's God is not some remote deity who created the world and then lost interest in it. On the contrary, the difference that God makes to us is the difference that a lively sense of God's presence makes.

4. This Life as a Prelude to a Future Life

Butler considered the expectation of a future life to be the foundation of all our hopes and fears. He does not state exactly why this is so, and most commentators have concluded that he is referring to hopes and fears regarding what will happen to us as individuals when we die. Such an intention would be contrary to Butler's general line of thought. More consonant with what Butler does say is the Platonic point that one cannot truly benefit by acting viciously and then escaping punishment. Since that is what appears to happen in this world, appearances must be denied. Secondly, and here Butler would agree with Hume, in this world there is an appearance that the superintendence of the universe is not entirely just. Thus, there are three logical options: (1) the universe is ultimately unjust, (2) contrary to appearances, this world is somehow just, or (3) the universe is just, but only when viewed more broadly than we are able to see now. Given these options, Butler thinks there are good practical reasons for accepting the third in practice.

The first chapter of the Analogy is devoted to the argument that what little we know of the nature of death is insufficient to warrant an assurance that death is the end of us. And when we lack sufficient warrant for acting on the presumption of a change, we must act on the presumption of continuance. The recurrent objection, offered by such otherwise sympathetic readers as Richard Swinburne, is that in the physical destruction of the body, we do have sufficient warrant. Roderick Chisholm (1986) has proposed a counter to this criticism.

Butler appends to his discussion of a future life a brief essay on personal identity, and this is the only part of the Analogy widely read today. That it is read independently is perhaps just as well since it is difficult to see how it is related to the general argument. Butler says he needs to answer objections to personal identity continuing after death, which he certainly must do. But the view he proposes to refute is Locke's, and Locke seemed not to see that his theory of personal identity presented a problem for expectation of a future life. Locke's theory was that memory is constitutive of personal identity. Even if Butler is right in his objection to Locke's theory, he certainly needs personal memories to be retained since they are presupposed by his theory of rewards and punishments after death.

5. The World as a Moral Order

Butler's work is directed mainly against skeptics (and those inclined toward skepticism) and as an aid for those who propose to argue with skeptics. The general motivation for his work is to overcome intellectual embarrassment at accepting the received systems of morals and religion. To succeed, Butler must present a case that is plausible if not fully probative, and he must do so without resorting to an overly reductive account of morals and religion. Butler's strategy is to naturalize morals and religion. Although generally scorning scholastic methods, Butler does accept the ontological argument for God's existence, the appeal to the unity and simplicity of the soul and the distinction of natural and revealed religion. The fundamental doctrine of natural religion is the efficacy of morals—that the categories of virtue and vice, already discussed in terms of human nature, have application to the larger world of nature. To some, fortune and misfortune in this world seem not to be correlated with any moral scheme. But, with numerous examples, Butler argues that the world as we ordinarily experience it does have the appearance of a moral order.

Butler takes up two objections: the possibility that the doctrine of necessity is true and the familiar problem of evil. With regard to necessity, he argues that, even if such is the case, we are in no position to live in accord with necessity since we cannot see our own or others' actions as entirely necessitated. Butler's approach to the problem of evil is to appeal to human ignorance, a principal theme in various aspects of his work. What Butler must show is that we do not know of the actual occurrence of any event such that it could not be part of a just world. Since he does appeal to our ignorance, Butler cannot be said to have produced a theodicy, a justification of the ways of God to us, but his strategy may show a greater intellectual integrity, and may be sufficient for his purposes.

6. The Christian Scriptures as a Revelation

Butler's treatment of revealed religion is less satisfactory, since he had only a partial understanding of modern biblical criticism. Butler does insist on treating the Bible like any other book for critical purposes. He maintains that if any biblical teaching appears immoral or contrary to what we know by our natural faculties, then that alone is sufficient reason for seeking another interpretation of the scripture. The point of a revelation is to supplement natural knowledge, not to overrule it. Far from compromising the role of religion, this view is entailed by the fact that nature, natural knowledge and revelation all have a common source in God.

It is only in the second part of his Analogy that Butler argues against the deists. The characterization of his work as on the whole a reply to the deists is entirely a modern invention and is not found anywhere in the first century of reactions.

Only one chapter of the Analogy is devoted to the "Christian evidences" of miracles and prophecy, and even there Butler confines himself to some judicious remarks on the logical character of the arguments, especially with regard to miracles. In general, Butler presents revelation as wholly consistent with, but also genuinely supplemental of, natural knowledge. Hume says he castrated his Treatise of Human Nature (1739/1740) out of regards for Butler. But based on the texts that survive, there is no reason to think Hume would have gotten the better of the argument. Charles Babbage (1837) eventually showed why Hume had no valid objection to Butler.

Unfortunately, Butler's account of scripture is entirely two-dimensional. He does not doubt the point that scripture was written in terms properly applicable to a previous state of society, but he has little sense of the canonical books themselves being redactions of a multitude of oral and literary traditions and sources.

7. Public Institutions as Moral Agents

In the six sermons preserved from the years he served as the Bishop of Bristol, Butler defends the moral nature of various philanthropic and political institutions of his day. And in his Charge to the Clergy at Durham, he presents a concise rationale for the Church.

8. Butler's Influence

Ernest Mossner (1936) is still the most useful survey of Butler's influence. Mossner claims that Butler was widely read in his own time, but his evidence may be insufficient to convince some. However that may be, there is no doubt that by the late eighteenth century Butler was widely read in Scottish universities, and from the early nineteenth century at Oxford, Cambridge and many American colleges, perhaps especially because the Scottish influence was so strong in America. Butler's work impressed David Hume and John Wesley, and Thomas Reid, Adam Smith and David Hartley considered themselves Butlerians. Butler was a great favorite of the Tractarians, but the association with them may have worked against his ultimate influence in England, especially since Newman attributed his own conversion to the Roman Church to his study of Butler. S. T. Coleridge was among the first to urge study of the sermons and to disparage the Analogy. The decline of interest in the Analogy in the late nineteenth century has never been satisfactorily explained, but Leslie Stephen's critical work was especially influential.

The editions most frequently cited today appeared only after wide interest in Butler's Analogy had evaporated. The total editions are sometimes said to be countless, but this is true only in the sense that there are no agreed criteria for individuating editions. The numerous ancillary essays and study guides are still useful as evidence of how Butler was studied and understood. At its height, Butler's influence cut across protestant denominational lines and party differences in the Church of England, but serious interest in the Analogy is now concentrated among certain Anglican writers.

9. References and Further Reading

Butler's first biography appeared in the supplement to the Biographia Britannica (London, 1766). The most frequently reprinted biography is by Andrew Kippis and appeared in his second edition of the Biographia Britannica (London, 1778-93). This second edition is often confused with the supplement to the first edition. The only full biography is Bartlett (1839).

The best modern edition of Butler's works is J.H. Bernard's, but it is a modernized text, as of 1900, and contains errors. Serious readers may consult the original editions, now available on microfilm.

a. Works by Butler

  • Several Letters to the Reverend Dr. Clarke. London: Knapton, 1716.
  • Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel. London: second edition, 1729; six sermons added in the 1749 edition.
  • Analogy of Religion, Natural and Revealed, to the Constitution and Nature. London: Knapton, 1736.
  • Charge Delivered to the Clergy. Durham: Lane, 1751.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Babbage, Charles. Ninth Bridgewater Treatise. London: J. Murray, 1837.
  • Babolin, Albino. Joseph Butler. Padova: LaGarangola, 1973. 2 vols.
  • Baker, Frank. "John Wesley and Bishop Joseph Butler: A Fragment of Wesley's Manuscript Journal 16th to 24th August 1739." Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 42 (May 1980) 93-100.
  • Bartlett, Thomas. Memoirs of the Life, Character and Writings of Joseph Butler. London: John W. Parker, 1839.
  • Beck, Lewis White. "A Neglected Aspect of Butler's Ethics." Sophia 5 (1937) 11-15.
  • Butler, J.F. "John Wesley's Defense Before Bishop Butler." Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 20 (1935) 63-67.
  • Butler, J.F. "John Wesley's Defense Before Bishop Butler: A Further Note." Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 20 (1936) 193-194.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. "Self-Profile" in Roderick M. Chisholm, ed. Radu J. Bogdan. Dordrecht:Reidel, 1986.
  • Cunliffe, Christopher, ed. Joseph Butler's Moral and Religious Thought: Tercentenary Essays. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal 'Ought' 1640-1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Mossner, E.C. Bishop Butler and the Age of Reason. New York: Macmillan, 1936.
  • Penelhum, Terence. Butler. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1985.
  • Stephen, Leslie. "Butler, Joseph." Dictionary of National Biography, 1886.
  • Sturgeon, Nicholas L. "Nature and Conscience in Butler's Ethics." Philosophical Review 85 (1976) 316-356.
  • Sykes, Norman. "Bishop Butler and the Primacy" Theology (1936) 132- 137.
  • Sykes, Norman. "Bishop Butler and the Primacy" (letter) Theology (1958) 23.

Author Information

David E. White
St. John Fisher College
U. S. A.

Giambattista Vico (1668—1744)

VicoGiambattista Vico is often credited with the invention of the philosophy of history. Specifically, he was the first to take seriously the possibility that people had fundamentally different schema of thought in different historical eras. Thus, Vico became the first to chart a course of history that depended on the way the structure of thought changed over time.

To illustrate the difference between modern thought and ancient thought, Vico developed a remarkable theory of the imagination. This theory led to an account of myth based on ritual and imitation that would resemble some twentieth century anthropological theories. He also developed an account of the development of human institutions that contrasts sharply with his contemporaries in social contract theory. Vico's account centered on the class struggle that prefigures nineteenth and twentieth century discussions.

Vico did not achieve much fame during his lifetime or after. Nevertheless, a wide variety of important thinkers were influenced by Vico’s writings. Some of the more notable names on this list are Johann Gottfried von Herder, Karl Marx, Samuel Taylor Coleridge, James Joyce, Benedetto Croce, R. G. Collingwood and Max Horkheimer. References to Vico’s works can be found in the more contemporary writings of Jürgen Habermas, Hans-Georg Gadamer, Alasdair MacIntyre and many others.

There is no question that his work is difficult to grasp. Vico’s style is challenging. Further, he is heavily influenced by a number of traditions that many philosophers may find unfamiliar: the natural law tradition of thinkers like Grotius; the Roman rhetorical tradition of authors like Quintillian; and the current science and anthropology of his day. Nevertheless, Vico’s theories on culture, language, politics and religion are deeply insightful and have excited the imaginations of those who have read him.

Table of Contents

  1. Vico’s Life
  2. Early Works
    1. Vico as Anti-Cartesian and Anti-Enlightenment
    2. On the Study Methods of Our Time
    3. On the Ancient Wisdom of the Italians
      1. The Verum-Factum Principle
      2. Metaphysical Points and the Attack on Cartesian Stoicism
      3. Vico’s Use of Etymology
  3. Vico and Jurisprudence
    1. The Universal Law (Il Diritto Universale)
    2. The Verum/Certum Principle
    3. The Natural Law and the Law of the Gentes
  4. The New Science
    1. The Conceit of Nations and the Conceit of Scholars
    2. The New Critical Art and the Poetic Wisdom
    3. Vico’s Method
    4. The Ideal Eternal History
    5. The New Science and the Roman Catholic Church
    6. The Three Principles of History: Religion, Marriage and Burial
    7. The Imaginative Universal
    8. The Discovery of the True Homer
    9. The Barbarism of Reflection
  5. Autobiography
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Vico’s Life

Giambattista Vico was born in a small room above his father’s bookshop on the Via San Biagio dei Librai in the old center of Naples on June 23rd, 1668 . His family was poor, and Giambattista was the sixth of eight children (Auto 215-6). Vico recounts that at the age of seven he fell from the top of a ladder, probably in his father’s bookshop, and seriously injured his head. He had to spend three years recovering from the injury (Auto 111), and for most of his life he complained of bouts of ill health.

Upon his recovery, Vico studied scholastic philosophy and jurisprudence. He worked with a number of Jesuit tutors, but as he grew older he taught himself these traditions (Auto 118). From 1686 to 1695, Vico worked as a tutor for the Rocca family in Vatolla, approximately 100 kilometers from Naples. During this time, he gave up his study of scholastic philosophy, and concentrated on the study of Plato and poets such as Virgil, Dante and Petrarch (Auto 120-2). Vico depicts these years as a time when he lived in isolation and during which Naples was overrun by Cartesian scientists (Auto 132). However, Vico was in contact with Naples during this period, and he completed his law degree during this time.

In 1699, Vico became a professor of rhetoric at the University of Naples, a position he held until 1741. He also married and later had three children. In 1709, Vico published his first major work On the Study Methods of Our Time which was a defense of humanistic education. This was followed in 1710 by his work on metaphysics: On the Ancient Wisdom of the Italians Unearthed From the Origins of the Latin Language. This was intended to be the first part of a trilogy including a volume on physics and a volume on moral philosophy. However, he never completed the remaining volumes. During this period, Vico recognized four authors as his most important influences: Plato, Tacitus, Grotius and Bacon.

Vico’s job as a professor of rhetoric was primarily to prepare students for law school; however, he desired to be promoted to the superior position of professor of law. To achieve this goal, he published his longest work, in three volumes, from 1720 to 1722, generally referred to as Universal Law (Il Diritto Universale). However, due to political circumstances, he was defeated in the contest for the chair, despite having superior credentials and doing better in the oral competition for the job (Auto 163-4).

Vico then abandoned his search for a chair of law and dedicated himself to explicating his own philosophy. To reach a wider audience, he began to write in Italian instead of Latin. In 1725 he published the first edition of his major work, New Science. Vico was dissatisfied with that text, however, and in 1730 published a radically different second edition. He continued to revise that text throughout his later years and the variation that was published in 1744 is considered his definitive work.

Vico sent copies of his works to influential thinkers in other parts of Europe. While he had little success achieving fame in the north, he did make a large impact in Venice. In 1725, Vico was contacted by a Venetian journal that was going to publish a series of essays written by scholars about their lives; he was the first and only contributor to the series. He updated his essay a few times and had it published as his Autobiography.

Vico did have some political influence in his later years. In 1734 Naples was retaken by the Spanish from the Austrians who had ruled it from 1704. The new viceroy named Vico the Royal Historiographer of Naples. Due to failing health, Vico’s son Gennaro took his chair of rhetoric in 1741 and Giambattista Vico died in 1744.

2. Early Works

a. Vico as Anti-Cartesian and Anti-Enlightenment

Vico is rightfully cast as a counter-Enlightenment thinker. In the face of the Enlightenment emphasis on doing natural science through the search for clear and distinct ideas, Vico saw himself as a defender of rhetoric and humanism. Many of Vico’s ideas are most easily grasped through a contrast with Cartesian rationalism and specifically Descartes’ emphasis on the geometric method. However, it is unclear exactly the extent to which Vico disagreed with the overall project of the Enlightenment. In a number of respects, Vico engaged in the same type of philosophical investigations as other eighteenth-century thinkers. He calls his main work a 'science', and claims Bacon as a major influence. Vico searched for a universal mental dictionary, and his science may be seen as its own type of encyclopedia. Further, recent scholarship suggests that Vico was heavily influenced by Malebranche. So while there is absolutely no question that Vico remains a staunch defender of ancient rhetoric, how much of the rest of the Enlightenment he rejects is a question.

The main debate between Vico and Descartes is over the value of the imagination and of rhetoric. In the opening of the Discourse on Method, Descartes rejects rhetoric and culture as sources of certainty. This implies, for Descartes, that there really is no value for these institutions. If one can state an idea clearly, then there is no need for rhetoric to defend it. While Descartes’ view was probably more subtle than this, as Cartesian science swept into Naples people began teaching children math and critique at the expense of training imagination.

Vico would devote most of his writings to stemming this tide by defending the importance of rhetoric. Vico began this defense in the Study Methods by claiming that children should develop their imaginations when they are young. This defense would continue in different forms until the New Science when Vico articulated the poetic wisdom which is an entire way of thinking based on the imagination and rhetoric. These points will be articulated below.

b. On the Study Methods of Our Time

As professor of rhetoric, Vico was required to give inaugural orations each academic year. His first six orations are an extended defense of the study of virtue and the liberal arts; these orations have been translated and given the title On Humanistic Education. The seventh oration was expanded by Vico and published by him as a small book entitled On the Study Methods of Our Time. The subject of the work was to determine the best method by which to educate people: the Ancient method that emphasizes rhetoric and imagination; or the Cartesian method that emphasizes conceptual thought. His conclusion is that both methods are important (SM 6). However, because Vico actually defends the value of the Ancient method against the Cartesian method (which rejects the value of the ancient tradition), this work is seen as a cornerstone of Vico’s counter-Enlightenment stance.

Vico defines a study method as having three parts. The instruments are the systematic order by which the course of study progresses. The aids are the tools one would use along the course of study such as the books to read. The aims are the goals of the study (SM 6-8).

Vico spends the majority of the work criticizing the modern instruments of learning in favor of the ancient ones. The modern Cartesian method teaches the method of philosophical critique which concentrates on teaching students how to find error and falsity in one’s thinking. The emphasis is on critiquing ideas by finding weaknesses in their foundation (SM 13).

The ancient instrument is the art of topics. This is the art by which one uses the imagination to find connections between ideas. This art shows students how to make new arguments rather than critiquing the arguments of other people. In Aristotelean logic, it emphasizes finding middle terms in order to create persuasive syllogisms. Further, it shows how a speaker can find a connection with an audience that will make a speech persuasive (SM 14-16).

For Vico, the argumentis over whether to teach children to find faults with arguments or to create arguments imaginatively; he argues that both are necessary. However, it is essential to teach children the art of topics first. This is because children have naturally strong imaginations. This needs to be developed early. After the children have developed these strong imaginations, then they can learn Cartesian critique (SM 13-14).

Vico suggests it is vital to develop the imagination of children because imagination is essential for doing ethics. The Cartesian method is effective in those instances where geometric certainty may be found. However, in most ethical situations, this certainty will not be possible. In these cases, the art of topics is vital because it allows one to recognize the best course of action and persuade others to pursue that course. Prudent individuals are those who can use their imaginations to uncover new ways of looking at a situation rather than critiquing a pre-existing belief. So the imagination and the art of topics are vital for prudence in a way that the Cartesian method cannot satisfy (SM 33-34). This is Vico’s first attempt to defend the power of rhetoric against Descartes.

c. On the Ancient Wisdom of the Italians Unearthed from the Origins of the Latin Language

i. The Verum-Factum Principle

Perhaps the greatest significance of the Ancient Wisdom lies in its presentation of the verum-factum principle. This and the ideal eternal history are Vico’s two most famous ideas. The verum-factum principle holds that one can know the truth in what one makes. Vico writes, “For the Latins, verum (the true) and factum (what is made) are interchangeable, or to use the customary language of the Schools, they are convertible (Ancient Wisdom 45).”

This presents a serious challenge to Cartesian science. The Cartesians had always assumed that the natural world provided certain ideas while the human world -- the world of culture -- was uncertain. This principle turns that around. Because God made the natural world, only God can know it. Humans can understand the human world because humans made it. This provides the foundation for the New Science since it suggests that the true focus of science should be the human world not the natural world.

While Vico couches this in an etymology, he does provide another justification for it. Descartes famously used "I think therefore I am" to provide a first principle that refutes skepticism. Vico claims that this does not work because it does not entirely address the challenge of the skeptics. The skeptic knows that he or she exists. The skeptic does not, however, know anything significant about that existence because the skeptic cannot know the cause of his or her ideas (AW 55). The verum-factum principle solves the skeptic’s problem by explaining that since we are the cause of what we make, we can know what was made. Since humans have made the civil world, they can understand the cause of the civil world and know the truth about it. Thus the skeptic, who claims knowledge is impossible, is incorrect because it is possible to know the truth about what humans have made. For Vico, making something becomes the criteria for knowing the truth about it (AW 56).

It is important to note that Vico does not appear to hold that the only truth humans can know is of what humans make. Especially in his later writings, Vico holds that through the world humans make, humans can witness eternal truths such as the ideal eternal history and the verum-factum principle itself. The verum-factum principle ought to be read in conjunction with the verum/certum principle outlined in the Universal Law and discussed below (Verene, 1981, 56-7).

ii. Metaphysical Points and the Attack on Cartesian Stoicism

The majority of the Ancient Wisdom is spent on a metaphysics that culminates in Vico’s idea of metaphysical points. Vico regarded Descartes as a stoic who held a mechanistic view of the universe. Descartes himself was a dualist; however, Vico is looking at the Cartesian scientists who followed Descartes and saw in them an abandonment of any ultimate truth as well as a reduction of existence to the motion of bodies. Vico links this metaphysical view to the ethical stoic view that deemphasizes both freedom and the hope of finding transcendent wisdom. He argues for a dualistic view that establishes a strong separation between the physical and eternal. This allows for a Platonic ethics which calls for philosophers to move from the physical to witnessing a higher realm.

In the Ancient Wisdom, Vico tries to justify this separation by arguing that the physical world cannot move itself. The only source of motion is not found in the physical but in the infinite. The infinite lacks motion but can provide motion to the world through metaphysical points, those places in which the infinite provides motion (conatus) to the physical. Vico again provides a fanciful etymology for this, claiming that the Latin words for point and momentum were synonymous since both refer to indivisible entities (AW 69). While Vico attacks Descartes’ stoicism throughout his writings, it is unclear to what extent Vico retains to this particular metaphysical view.

iii. Vico’s Use of Etymology

The Ancient Wisdom is one of Vico’s first major attempts to use etymology as a philosophical tool. Vico claims that by understanding the origin of words, it is possible to understand an ancient wisdom that has valuable insight. In the Ancient Wisdom, this insight is into metaphysical truth. In the later works, these etymologies reveal the nature of human laws and customs. He often takes the names of mythological gods or Roman legal terms and uses them to derive lessons from the origins of these words. This use of etymology is consistent with Vico’s overriding goal of demonstrating that ancient wisdom is valuable and requires careful attention on the part of the reader.

These etymologies are almost always extremely problematic given later research that has been done on the origin of languages, which undercuts Vico’s interpretation. This presents a serious problem for people trying to find philosophical merit in Vico’s texts. However, two things are worth keeping in mind when looking at Vico’s etymologies and his later analysis of myth. First, Vico usually provides other forms of demonstration to make his points rather than just relying on etymology. Their failure rarely represents a serious undermining of the entire system. Second, Vico is trying to do philosophy in a new way that involves making connections rather than making Cartesian distinctions. It may be worth engaging these etymologies to see how Vico imaginatively constructs these connections without worrying as much about the validity of the etymologies. One does not want to be too apologetic for Vico; however, there are reasons for not dismissing his system entirely solely on the basis of the etymologies.

3. Vico and Jurisprudence

a. The Universal Law (Il Diritto Universale)

The Universal Law has been neglected in Vico scholarship because of its complexity and because it has only recently been translated into English. However, its three volumes taken together represent Vico’s longest work: On the One Principle and one End of Universal Law, On the Constancy of the Jurisprudent and Dissertations. It is often referred to as Il diritto universale. This is because the term diritto signifies a universal structure of law as opposed to legge which refers to particular laws made by particular individuals. English does not make this distinction.

The goal of this work is to show that all truth and all law (diritto) comes from God (On the One Principle 50, 54). Hence, he wants to demonstrate that there is truly one universal law in history. To do this, he needs to show that while there are different manifestations of the one law, they are all reducible to the one eternal law. He is not concerned with how one particular law (legge) may or may not fit the system, because there will be instances where bad judges make bad decisions. However, this does not mean that all law (diritto) is arbitrary. Indeed, Vico holds that there is still a consistency to history that reveals how God’s divine providence orchestrates the enactment of the natural law through the civil law.

The majority of the work consists in trying to understand the ways in which different societies in history enacted the eternal law differently. He does this through fanciful etymologies and extended interpretations of Roman law. This work has many of the same characteristics of the New Science but lacks a full explanation of the poetic wisdom underlying ancient myths.

b. The Verum/Certum Principle

The essential companion to the verum-factum principle is the verum/certum principle. Vico writes, “The certain is part of the true (On the One Principle 90).” This, as much as the verum-factum principle, represents Vico’s attitude toward history. By certain, Vico means the particular facts of history. So the principle is saying that by looking at particular facts of history, it is possible to discover universal truth. This principle justifies Vico’s use of philological and historical evidence to make metaphysical claims.

Not all certa are part of the true, however. Because humans are free, they can make bad choices. So legislators are capable of passing bad laws as well as good laws. When a choice is made contrary to reason, a certum occurs that does not connect with universal truth (On the One Principle 90). At other times, these laws are rational and therefore part of the true. So when the philosopher tries to deduce the verum from the certum, the primary difficulty is in establishing which certa represent rational and true choices and which are bad certa and ought to be disregarded.

Vico sees laws as being rational when they are in accord with public utility (On the One Principle 91). A legislator’s laws are certain not because of a direct insight into the mind of God; rather, divine providence orchestrates history such that when legislators make decisions they find useful, they are unknowingly doing the work of divine providence (On the One Principle 65). In order to understand the eternal law, then, one has to first understand the necessity that different legislators faced through history. By understanding their responses one can see the motion of divine providence. So Vico does not grasp universal truth through a direct analysis of God’s will but rather by analyzing the way in which necessity led legislators to produce the institutions of history.

c. The Natural Law and the Law of the Gentes

Vico defines the natural law by writing “the natural law proceeds from choosing the good that you know to be equitable (On the One Principle 66).” This law does not change; however, the way in which utility constitutes what it means to be equitable does change. Early in human history it is more equitable to give the rulers more power and more wealth to control the weak. As the need for this control lessens, wealth becomes distributed more evenly.

At the origin of humanity, there were families in which the fathers used violence and religious ritual to control their children. While the private law of the fathers was harsh, it gave stability to the families. These fathers were independent of each other and had no reason to fight. All the violence was directed internally in order to control their children.

Eventually, wandering people who did not have their own families and did not have anything checking their passions, wanted to benefit from the protection of the fathers. This created a practical problem for the fathers because they wanted to use the stragglers for their own ends but were afraid of revolution. Fathers from different families banded together to create the law of the greater gentes -- clans or tribes -- as a way of suppressing the newcomers (On the One Principle 97). Again, the fathers, who now constitute an aristocracy of nobles or heroes, are not particularly worried about fighting each other; they were worried primarily about controlling this new lower class of people.

Two things are of immediate significance in Vico’s account. First, Vico makes a strong connection between public law and private law. Indeed, the private law of the families leads to the public law of the nobles. Second, Vico is making an important case against social contract theory. Rather than society forming by an agreement of all its members, society is formed by the aristocrats who then, out of a sense of utility, impose a violent rule. Social contract theory does not make sense for Vico because it would take humans a long time to develop the ability to reason through such an agreement.

Much of the rest of Vico’s Universal Law explains history as an extended class struggle between the heroes who descended from the first fathers and the plebeians who descended from those who wandered into the gentes. Vico examines at length both ancient Roman myths and ancient Roman jurisprudence to show how utility, generated through the work of divine providence, directed this struggle. The detail with which Vico engages in this project is extraordinary. It is significant that Vico is unclear as to how this class struggle ends. He praises the Romans for their sense of virtue and the Law of the XII Tables (On the Constancy 257-276). However, what this means for the course of history is left unclear. Vico would not present his answer to this until he wrote the New Science.

4. The New Science

a. The Conceit of Nations and the Conceit of Scholars

The main problem Vico saw with the Universal Law is that it failed to portray clearly the origin of society. To grasp that origin, Vico developed a new critical art to reveal how the most ancient humans thought. This art rested on recognizing two conceits. Both of these conceits can be traced to a principle which Vico finds in Tacitus: “Because of the indefinite nature of the human mind, whenever it is lost in ignorance man makes himself the measure of all things (NS 120).” This axiom not only serves as a basis for these conceits but also the whole of poetic wisdom.

The conceit of nations holds that every nation thinks it is the oldest in the world and that all other nations derived their wisdom from them (NS 125). Because one nation does not understand the origin of others, it assumes all other nations learned from it. This conceit prevents nations from realizing that every nation actually had its own independent origin. Thus, they fail to realize that similarities between cultures do not indicate a common origin but instead indicate universal institutions that are necessary for all cultures.

The conceit of scholars is that scholars tend to assume that everyone thinks in the same way that contemporary scholars do (NS 127). This conceit has kept scholars from understanding both ancient mythology and ancient jurisprudence. By assuming the ancients thought the same way as moderns do, the scholars assume that ancient mythology is simply bad science and superstition. What the modern scholars fail to grasp is that the ancients actually were solving different problems in a radically different mental framework. The ancients were doing what they found to be useful; however, their way of thinking indicated radically different ideas of what was necessary and how to get it.

It is the conceit of scholars that thus provides the basis for the claim that Vico was the first true philosopher of history and an anticipation of Hegel. He was the first to try to explain how people thought differently in different eras. Further, he tries to show how one form of thinking led into another, thereby creating a cycle of history.

b. The New Critical Art and the Poetic Wisdom

In order to overcome the prejudice of the conceit of scholars, Vico created a new “metaphysical art of criticism (NS348).” This art goes beyond the philological art of criticism which simply verifies the authenticity of particular facts. This new art distinguishes the truth in history from the accidental -- as dictated by the verum-certum principle -- by grasping the manner in which the first humans thought. This will allow the philosopher to witness the universal truth of the ideal eternal history, described below. While Vico does not clearly define this critical art, it is marked by elements he has always been working with: using rhetoric, creative etymologies and seeing connections rather than making distinctions.

The art reveals the way the first humans thought, which Vico calls 'poetic wisdom'. Vico uses the term wisdom to emphasize that this way of thinking has its own truth or validity that contemporary conceptual thinkers do not recognize. It is poetic because it is marked by imaginative creativity rather than discursive analysis.

Vico holds that poetic wisdom is fundamentally different from modern wisdom. The fundamental difference between the two is that modern wisdom uses reflection to create concepts while the poetic wisdom does not reflect but spontaneously generates imaginative universals which are described below. The poetic wisdom generates a common sense that is shared by an entire peoples (NS 142).

c. Vico’s Method

Vico places his new critical art in the context of a more general method for his New Science. The section of the New Science entitled ‘Method’ is a sharp departure from any sort of Cartesian science. It in no way involves the rigorous and clear movement from premises to conclusions advocated by Descartes. Instead, Vico describes three different types of proofs that will be employed by the science: 1) theological proofs which witness the movement of divine providence; 2) philosophical proofs which are based on the uniformity of poetic wisdom; and 3) philological proofs which recognize certain elements of history. These proofs rely more on recognizing the way in which ideas have to fit together to reveal hidden or divine patterns. The method of the science is to bring all these proofs together in a way that produces a coherent and true narrative. Vico writes, “We make bold to affirm that he who meditates this Science narrates to himself this ideal eternal history so far as he himself makes it for himself by that proof ‘it had, has, and will have to be’ (NS 348).” Rather than a Cartesian conceptual scheme, Vico’s science is one in which truth is attained by imaginatively linking different elements together to reveal the order of history.

An important example of the method of the New Science is revealed in Vico’s use of axioms (degnità). Traditionally, axioms have a fixed place in the order of geometric proofs following directly from definitions and proofs. Vico intends his axioms to be weaved imaginatively throughout all the ideas of the text (Goetsch). Vico describes this with this analogy, “just as the blood does in animate bodies, so will these elements (degnità) course through our Science and animate it (NS 199).”

d. The Ideal Eternal History

While the conceit of scholars may be what is at the core of Vico’s significance, the ideal eternal history is, along with the verum-factum principle, Vico’s most famous concept. The ideal eternal history can be thought of loosely as a Platonic ideal. Stated in the abstract, the ideal eternal history is the perfect course through which all nations pass. In practice, each nation travels through it slightly differently.

Vico describes this ideal eternal history most colorfully when he gives this axiom: “Men first felt necessity, then look for utility, next attend to comfort, still later amuse themselves with pleasure, thence grow dissolute in luxury, and finally go mad and waste their substance (NS 241).” It is possible in the quote to see the same emphasis on utility that Vico had in the Universal Law. However, what changes is that this history is now presented clearly as a circular motion in which nations rise and fall. Nations eternally course and recourse through this cycle passing through these eras over and over again.

Vico divides the ideal eternal history into three ages which he adopts from Varro. Vico first used these three ages in the Universal Law but now he presents it with more clarity. Indeed, Book IV of the New Science is a comparison of how different human institutions existed differently in the three ages of history. Clearly the history of Rome is again Vico’s primary model for the ideal eternal history.

The first age is the age of gods. In this age, poetic wisdom is very strong. Again, there is an aristocracy of fathers who know how to control themselves and others through religion. These fathers, which Vico calls theological poets, rule over small asylums and the famuli who are wandering outsiders who come to them seeking protection. The famuli is the term Vico now uses for those who wandered into the lands of the fathers in the Universal Law.

The second age is the age of heroes. In this age, the famuli transform from being simple slaves to plebeians who want some of the privileges of the rulers. The theological poets transform into heroes. These heroes show their strength by fighting each other as illustrated in Homer. However, for Vico, the most important conflict is not between the heroes but between the heroes and the plebeians fighting for their own privileges.

The third age is the age of humans. Divine providence orchestrates the class wars so that the heroes inadvertently undermine themselves by conceding certain powers to the plebeians. The plebeians are able to build these concessions in order to advance a new way of thinking. In the previous ages, society was ruled by poetic wisdom which controlled all actions through ritual. In order to undermine the power of these rituals, the plebeians slowly found ways to assert the power of conceptual wisdom, which is the ability to think scientifically and rationally. This way of thinking gives the plebeians more power and removes the stranglehold of poetic wisdom on humanity.

Unfortunately, while this conceptual wisdom gives the plebeians their freedom, it undermines the cultural unity provided by poetic wisdom. While all in society become free and equal, the religious inspiration to work for the common good rather than the individual becomes lost. Society eventually splinters into a barbarism of reflection in which civil wars are fought solely for personal gain. This is the barbarism of reflection which returns society to its origin.

One of the major debates about the ideal eternal history is whether it is a circle or a spiral. Those who suggest that it is a spiral hold that each time a nation goes through the ideal eternal history, it improves. Those who suggest it is a circle hold that each cycle of the ideal eternal history really does reduce it back to its beginning. Unfortunately, this appears to be an instance where Vico had to remain silent because, had he tried to resolve the issue, he would have had to make some sort of comment on the relation of the church to society which he was not prepared to do. As a result, the debate about how best to read the ideal eternal history continues.

e. The New Science and the Roman Catholic Church

It is helpful to note that during Vico’s life and especially during the production of the New Science, the Inquisition was quite active in Naples. The Inquisition put some Neapolitain works on the Index and tried close friends of Vico (Bedani, 7-21).

What this means for Vico’s faith is unclear; however, it seemed to cause Vico to make a very important and awkward decision. Vico claims that while the ideal eternal history applies to all gentile nations, it does not apply to the Hebrews. This is because the Hebrews always had the revealed wisdom of God and did not need the pattern of the ideal eternal history to develop (NS 369). Hence, Vico leaves out any discussion of the Bible or any evidence about early Judaism as he constructs his science. As illustrated by The Universal Law, Vico clearly held that God existed and that it is God’s order that history passes through. So there is good reason to think Vico had a theistic foundation. It is unclear, however, whether Vico really held that the Hebrews were exempt from the Ideal Eternal History or if this was just a way of avoiding the Index.

f. The Three Principles of History: Religion, Marriage and Burial

Vico uses his new critical art to provide a better account of the origin of society than provided in The Universal Law. Vico explains the three principles of history: religion, marriage and burial. These are principles both in the sense that they are the first things in society and in that they lie at the core of social existence.

Vico posits that before human society there were giants roaming the earth who had no ability to check their violent passions. Eventually, a thunder strike occurred that was so violent it caused some of the giants to stop their passionate wanderings. These giants felt a fear that was unique because unlike a natural danger, it was produced by a cause the giants did not recognize (NS 377, 504). Since the giants did not understand the cause of the fear, other than the sky, they took what they knew (which was their own passion) and attributed it to a giant who lived in the sky. This gave birth to Jove, the first imaginative universal, which is discussed below.

Out of this terror, giants felt shame for the first time. Specifically, they were ashamed about copulating randomly and out in the open. Vico writes, “So it came about that each of them would drag one woman into his cave and would keep her there in perpetual company for the rest of their lives (NS 504).” This created the second imaginative universal, Juno. It also caused the giants to settle down in a particular area. They saw the need to keep this area clean so they began to bury their dead.

There is no question that this account of the origin of humanity is peculiar. Nevertheless, Vico finds the account satisfying because it does not place any rational decision making at the origin of society. Society does not develop in a social contract but in the spontaneous checking of passions that produces poetic wisdom.

g. The Imaginative Universal

The bulk of the New Science is the description of Poetic Wisdom. This is the way of mythic thinkers at the origin of society. It is also the manner of thinking that dominated society until the plebeians gained control of society through the class struggle. Vico goes into detail explaining things such as the poetic metaphysics, poetic logic, poetic economics and poetic geography. Throughout this section, Vico spells out the details of the development of the age of gods and then the breakdown of the age of heroes into the age of humans.

In this section, Vico explains his perhaps most controversial notion: what he calls the imaginative universals or the poetic characters. Some scholars, most notably Benedetto Croce, hold that this notion is a tragic problem on Vico’s part and is best ignored. Other scholars use the imaginative universal as a way to defend Vico as a champion of the philosophical need to use imagination and rhetoric. Vico himself saw the imaginative universal as the ‘master key’ to his New Science which seems to make the topic worth investigating (NS 34).

The imaginative universals are tricky to grasp, but two fairly non-contentious axioms can help provide a background. The first is that first language would be a combination of mute gestures and rudimentary, monosyllabic words (NS 225, 231). The second is that “Children excel in imitation; we observe that they generally amuse themselves by imitating whatever they are able to apprehend (NS 215).” This is connected to Vico’s notion that people grasp what they do not understand by relating it to something familiar. In the case of children, they use their powerful imaginations to understand things by copying their movements.

Vico speculates that the first humans must have had minds that resembled children. So, when they first started to use language, rather than naming objects conceptually, they imitated those objects with mute gestures and monosyllabic cries. Thus, when the thunder struck, the first people imitated the shaking of the sky and shouted the interjection pa (father) thereby creating the first word (NS 448).

This makes imaginative universals quite distinct from intelligible universals. An intelligible universal would be constructed through an act similar to what we would ordinarily think of as 'naming'. An imaginative universal is created through the repeated imitation of an event. Words are merely the associated sound that goes with that imitation. So, for Vico, the first words were actually rituals that served as metaphors for events.

A helpful passage for understanding this is found in Axiom XLVII. Vico writes, “Thence springs this important consideration in poetic theory: the true war chief, for example, is the Godfrey that Torquato Tasso imagines; and all the chiefs who do not conform throughout to Godfrey are not true chiefs of war (NS 205).” The imaginative universal, Godfrey, is the name used for anyone who performs the rituals of the true war chief. All true war chiefs actually become Godfrey through their actions. Vico applies this principle to the gods of the Roman pantheon. For example, anyone getting married becomes Juno and anyone practicing divination becomes Apollo. The bulk of the section on the poetic wisdom in the New Science endeavors to demonstrate how the first societies managed to create institutions solely through the use of these imaginative universals.

Many readers find Vico’s account of the imaginative universal utterly baffling. Vico’s challenging writing style, combined with the fanciful way in which he interprets ancient myths, make this section of the New Science a mystery for first-time readers. However, in approaching this section, it is helpful to remember that Vico holds that this type of thinking is by definition distinct from our more common way of reflective thought. Further, there are contemporary anthropologists who see Vico as a precursor to their discoveries. Ultimately, Vico’s idea may not really be so far-fetched.

h. The Discovery of the True Homer

Book III of the New Science contains one of Vico’s most remarkable insights. Vico was among the first, if not the first, to hold that Homer was not one individual writing poems but was a conglomeration of different poets who expressed the will of the entire people. His arguments for this are a combination of philological claims which show that there are many disparate elements in the work, as well as philosophical claims that when the work was composed, people could not have been using modern wisdom to write it as a modern epic.

Vico’s motivation for this reading of Homer is his quest to find a metaphysical truth to history. If the works of Homer were written by one person, then the truths held in it would be arbitrary. However, Vico argues that Homer’s poems spring from the common sense of all the Greek people. Therefore, the poems represent institutions universal to a culture that can then be used to justify universal truths. Whereas in the Universal Law, where Vico examined Roman law to see its universality, he has now replaced that idea with Homer’s poems since those poems date back earlier than the law.

i. The Barbarism of Reflection

The brief conclusion of the New Science largely pays homage to the glory of divine providence. Within it, Vico gives a brief statement about the barbarism of reflection. As indicated in the section on the Ideal Eternal History, Vico sees that history is cyclical. Vico claims that history begins in a barbarism of sense and ends in a barbarism of reflection. The barbarism of reflection is a returned barbarism in which the common sense established by religion through poetic wisdom holding a society together has been broken down by individual interests. The interests are spurred because individuals each think according to their own conceptual scheme without concern for the society, which makes it barbaric.

Vico describes the returned barbarism this way, “such peoples [in the barbarism], like so many beasts, have fallen into the custom of each man thinking only of his own private interests and have reached the extreme delicacy, or better of pride, in which like wild animals they bristle and lash out at the slightest displeasure (NS 1106).” These private interests lead into a civil war in which everyone betrays everyone else. This takes humanity back to where it started -- individual giants acting solely on their own individual passions.

Unfortunately, Vico does not give a clear ethical position on what to do in the face of the barbarism of reflection. He wrote a section of the New Science called a Practic but decided not to include it. Clearly, Vico wants his readers to recognize universal truth and appreciate a rhetorical approach to philosophy. But, what this means in particular for an ethical theory is a matter of some debate.

5. Autobiography

Vico’s Autobiography is worthy of philosophical investigation. It was written by the invitation of a journal which was going to publish a series of essays by scholars describing their lives. Vico was the only one to contribute to the series. The journal was published in 1725 and he updated it in 1728 and 1731.

On one level, the Autobiography contains the basic facts of his life recounted above. However, it seems clear that Vico does have an important philosophical agenda that goes beyond any attempt to recount simply the facts of his life. The most immediate piece of evidence for this is that on the first line Vico gets the year of his birth wrong. He gives it as 1670 rather than 1668. Given how easy it would be to access his baptism records in Naples, it is entirely possible that Vico intended his audience to know he was being imprecise, and perhaps imaginative, when he composed his Autobiography.

One way of reading the Autobiography is as a further attack on Descartes. The Autobiography itself highlights his conflict with the Cartesians of Naples. Further, rather than using the first person, as Descartes does in the Discourse on Method, Vico refers to himself in the third person. The fact that Vico willfully gets his birth date wrong could be an indication that he dismisses Descartes’ calls for certainty.

Beyond that, there appear to be strong parallels between Vico’s task in the Autobiography and in the New Science. Returning to the verum-factum principle, Vico claims that the task of the New Science is not simply to retell the facts of history. Instead, it is to understand the workings of divine providence in this history by remaking it. As quoted above in the section on Method, Vico emphasizes that to witness the ideal eternal history, the reader must make it for oneself (NS 349). In saying this, Vico turns the entire New Science into a text that could be thought of as a type of fable. In the Autobiography, Vico, rather than giving a strictly accurate account of his life, makes a fable which actually parallels some elements of the ideal eternal history. For example, Vico’s fall in the bookstore may parallel the thunderstrike of Jove. Regardless of how strict this parallel is, Vico appears to be consciously applying some of his philosophical principles to his Autobiography (Verene 1990).

The Marquis of Villarosa wrote a conclusion to the Autobiography in 1818. He relates an odd story about Vico’s funeral. When Vico died, two groups, the professors at the University of Naples and the Confraternity of Santa Sophia, both wanted to carry the coffin to its resting place. A dispute broke out which could not be resolved. As a result, both sides abandoned the coffin and left. Vico was buried by officers of the Cathedral the next day (Auto 207-8).

6. References and Further Reading

Italian Editions of Vico

The standard Italian edition of Vico is: Opere di G. B. Vico, ed. Fausto Nicolini, 8 vols. (Bari: Laterza, 1911-1941). However, two other editions are being used more regularly. The first is: Vico, Giambattista. Opere, ed. Andrea Battistini, 2 vols. (Milan: Arnoldo Mondadori Editore, 1990). The second is a multi-volume edition edited by Paolo Cristofolini and published by Alfredo Guida under the auspices of the Instituto per la Storia del Pensiero Filosofico e Scientifico Moderno and the Centro di Studi Vichiani. This is an effort to systematically release all the works of Vico.

English Editions of Vico

  • The following are the English translations of Vico referred to in this article.
  • Vico, Giambattista. The Autobiography of Giambattista Vico. Translated by Thomas Goddard Bergin and Max Harold Fisch. Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1983.
  • Vico, Giambattista. The First New Science. Edited and Translated by Leon Pompa. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Vico, Giambattista. The New Science of Giambattista Vico (1744 edition). Including the “Practic of the New Science.” Translated by Thomas Goddard Bergin and Max Harold Fisch. Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1984.
  • Vico, Giambattista. On Humanistic Education (Six Inaugural Orations, 1699-1707) from the Definitive Latin Text, Introduction and Noted of Gian Galeazzo Visconti. Translated by Georgio A. Pinton and Artuhur W. Shippee. Introduction by Donald Phillip Verene. Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1993.
  • Vico, Giambattista. On the Most Ancient Wisdom of the Italians, Unearthed from the Origins of the Latin Language. Including the Disputations with the Giornale de’ Letterata d’Italia. Translated with an Introduction and Notes by L. M. Palmer. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 1988.
  • Vico, Giambattista. On the Study Methods of Our Time. Translated by Elio Gianturco. Reissued with a Preface by Donald Phillip Verene, and including “The Academies and the Relation between Philosophy and Eloquence,” Translated by Donald Phillip Verene. Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1990.
  • The Universal Law was translated by John D. Schaeffer and recently published in the following three separate volumes of New Vico Studies.
  • Vico, Giambattista. On the One Principle and One End of Universal Law. Translated by John D. Schaeffer. New Vico Studies vol. 21, 2003.
  • Vico, Giambattista. On the Constancy of the Jurisprudent. Translated by John D. Schaeffer. New Vico Studies vol. 23, 2005.
  • Vico, Giambattista. Dissertations [from the Universal Law]. Translated by John D. Schaeffer. New Vico Studies vol 24, 2006: 1-80.

Other Works Cited

  • Bedani, Gino. Vico Revisited: Orthodoxy, Naturalism and Science in the Scienza Nuova. Oxford: Berg, 1989.
  • Goetsch, James Robert. Vico’s Axioms: The Geometry of the Human World. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1995.
  • Verene, Donald Phillip. The New Art of Autobiography: An Essay on the Life of Giambattista Vico. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991.
  • Verene, Donald Phillip. Vico’s Science of the Imagination. Cornell: Cornell University Press, 1981.

Bibliographies on Vico

Benedetto Croce published a bibliography of works on Vico in 1904. This was updated by Fausto Nicolini in 1948. This bibliography was further updated: Donzelli, Maria. Contributo alla bibliografia vichiana (1948-1970). Naples: Guida Editori, 1973. And updated again: Battistini, Andrea. Nuovo contributo alla bibliografia vichiana (1971-1980). Studi vichiani 14. Naples: Guida 1983. Updates to this bibliography have been published as supplements to the Bolletino del Centro di Studi Vichiani.

For works in English, this volume compiles works on Vico as well as works citing Vico: Verene, Molly Black. Vico: A Bibliography of Works in English from 1884 to 1994. Bowling Green, OH: Philosophy Documentation Center, 1994. Supplements to this bibliography which update it from 1994 to the present have been appearing in New Vico Studies.

Author Information

Alexander Bertland
Niagara University
U. S. A.

Joseph Priestley (1733—1804)

priestleyA notable Enlightenment polymath, Joseph Priestley published almost two hundred works on natural philosophy, theology, metaphysics, political philosophy, politics, education, history and linguistics. Remembered today primarily as a scientist who isolated oxygen, Priestley considered his calling to be that of a theologian, and he spent most of his life working as a minister and teacher. He combined his Unitarian theology with an associationist, materialist and determinist philosophy to create a coherent world-view that was the subject of bitter controversy.

The implications of his metaphysics were challenging. Priestley posited that matter, far from being impenetrable and inert, was subject to internal forces such as attraction and compulsion. This enabled him to assert that the matter of the brain is sensitive to certain vibrations that form the basis of thought. He went on to argue in favor of a material basis for the soul and its complete physical unity with the body. Priestley believed that perception, knowledge, intellect, and memory were acquired through sensory experience and that simple ideas combined into complex ideas through a process of association. This mechanism was entirely material and therefore based on necessary causal laws determined by God.

Priestley tended to prioritize the practical and the experimental above the purely theoretical. His metaphysical beliefs grew in part from his passion for natural philosophy and his careful scientific investigation. His understanding of the world was based on an assumption that truths were demonstrable and revealed through observation and experience. This included studying scripture alongside the natural world in order to gain knowledge of a God who orchestrated and determined all events for the ultimate good of humanity. Priestley was a "rational dissenter" whose careful biblical exploration allowed him to argue for the unity of God. Jesus was wholly human and did not die as an atonement for inherently sinful humanity, but lived to exemplify the perfect moral life that all people could potentially attain.

Priestley argued that the truths of scripture were available to all through the careful application of reason. This influenced his liberal political position, as he penned many works in favor of complete toleration and minimal governmental intervention. Priestley believed that the story of humanity was a march of progress towards ultimate perfection. Liberal government was one means by which truth could triumph in an atmosphere of free and unfettered debate. Priestley was also a fervent millenarian, trusting in biblical prophecy and waiting for the second coming of Christ, the ultimate aim of all human progress. This optimistic liberalism saw Priestley through a barrage of vitriolic criticism and the infamous "Church and King" riots which destroyed his Birmingham home in 1791. Despite the disappointments of the French Revolution and his forced emigration, Priestley stuck tenaciously to his belief in progress and Providence. A hopeful advocate of reason and rational religion, he died with the conviction that his physical resurrection and perfect life with Christ would not be long coming

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical Sketch
    1. Religious Beliefs
    2. Education and Marriage
    3. Life as a Minister and Teacher
    4. Natural Philosophy
    5. Portrayal, Reception and Legacy
  2. Theology
    1. Method
    2. Principal Ideas
      1. Unitarianism
      2. The Atonement
      3. Predestination
      4. Original Sin and Grace
      5. The Soul
      6. The Millennium
    3. Reactions and Criticisms
  3. Politics and Political Philosophy
    1. Principal Ideas
    2. Priestley and the Law
    3. Toleration and the Pursuit of Truth
    4. Reactions and Criticisms
  4. Association of Ideas
    1. Principal Ideas
    2. Links to Other Ideas
    3. Reactions and
  5. 5. Matter and Spirit
    1. Principal Ideas
    2. Priestley, Newton and Boscovitch
    3. Theology
    4. Reactions and Criticisms
  6. Philosophical Necessity
    1. Principal Ideas
    2. Links to Other Ideas
    3. Reactions and Criticisms
  7. Philosophy of Education, History and Linguistics
    1. Principal Ideas
    2. History and Language
    3. Reactions and Criticisms
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
      1. Theology
      2. Politics and Political Philosophy
      3. Association of Ideas
      4. Matter and Spirit
      5. Philosophical Necessity
      6. Philosophy of Education, History and Linguistics
    2. General Secondary Sources
      1. Theology
      2. Politics
      3. Association of Ideas
      4. Matter and Spirit
      5. Philosophical Necessity
      6. Education

1. Biographical Sketch

Priestley's childhood was marked by upheaval, rejection and spiritual doubt, while his education granted him considerable intellectual liberty and independence of thought. To understand these early years of rejection, isolation and freedom is a significant step towards understanding Priestley's adult thought as earnest and rational but at times controversial, idiosyncratic and consistently misunderstood.

The following account of Priestley's life is taken mainly from his autobiography.

Priestley was born on March 13th, 1733 at Birstall Fieldhead, a small village just southwest of Leeds where his family had lived and worked for several generations. His father, Jonas Priestley, was a wool-cloth dresser and his mother, Mary Swift, came from a farming family. Priestley was their first-born child, but three brothers and two sisters soon followed in quick succession. The demands of a large family meant that the young Priestley was sent first to live his grandfather and later, after the death of his mother, to the home of his childless uncle and aunt.

a. Religious Beliefs

Priestley recalls religious devotion on the part of his parents, his uncle and his aunt. However, while Priestley shared his family's religiosity and remained a committed believer all his life, he was profoundly affected by early theological doubts. He tells us that he was "much distressed" because he could not "feel a proper repentance for the sin of Adam" and was equally disturbed by his failure to experience the "new birth" regarded as "necessary to salvation." Having a weak constitution and facing death during adolescence, Priestley was faced with the "horror" of feeling that God had forsaken him (Autobiography 71).

It is fortunate that Priestley had the intellectual and spiritual resources to deal with these fears. Although a strict Calvinist, his aunt often entertained liberal Armenian and Baxterian theologians, so the young Priestley was able to explore the rational theology that would quell the horrors that haunted him. He was eventually able to view his doubts as part of his progression towards truth. He writes that his illness, rigorous religious upbringing and failure to experience a conversion allowed him to acquire a "serious turn of mind," and his doubts were compensated by a rational understanding of God and proper action. However, as his theology drifted from that of his family and community, Priestley faced rejection and isolation. Priestley had grown up attending the Heckmondwike congregation and tells us that he desired to be admitted as a communicant. However, his membership was refused "because, when they interrogated me on the subject of the sin of Adam, I appeared not to be quite orthodox." When Priestley adopted Arianism at Daventry it marked a break with the family that would not be reversed (Autobiography 73).

b. Education and Marriage

As a boy Priestley attended several schools in the local area and learned Latin, Greek and Hebrew. When his illness prevented him from going to school, he continued his education at home. These early years of self-education were marked with the seriousness, hard work and intellectual isolation that Priestley found so productive in later life. During these years Priestley taught himself French, Italian, and High Dutch "without a master," while also learning geometry and algebra and reading the work of John Locke and Isaac Watts. In 1752 Priestley entered Daventry Academy, as his dissenting views prevented him from subscribing to the Westminster Confession and thus excluded him from the traditional universities. With young informal tutors and a liberal curriculum, Priestley found intellectual freedom and companionship and discovered the associationist ideas of David Hartley (Autobiography 70-75).

Priestley flourished at Daventry, enjoying the discipline and hard work and building "warm friendships." In contrast to the rejection and isolation of his childhood, Priestley found himself part of a community of likeminded thinkers. As an adult he was to continue to find intellectual companionship with middle class dissenters and liberals, such as the Lunar society in Birmingham and his fellow tutors at Warrington. In 1762 he also married happily Mary Wilkinson (1743-1796), the daughter of the famous iron master Isaac Wilkinson, whose sons John and William continued to expand the family's fortunes. He writes fondly although not passionately of Mary, calling his marriage a "very suitable and happy connexion" (Autobiography 87).

c. Life as a Minister and Teacher

Priestley graduated from Daventry in 1755 and moved to Needham Market, Suffolk, to work as a minister at the local chapel. It was not a happy time: lacking the financial assistance originally promised by his aunt, Priestley struggled for money and also struggled to be accepted into the community. No one came to the school he established and most were unable to accept his Arian theology.

Despite these problems, it was this combination of educator and minister that would keep Priestley employed throughout his life. In 1758 he moved to Nantwich in Cheshire and again took on a congregation and established a school. This time he was much more successful and his ideas were communicated and received with ease. In 1761 Priestley took up a tutorship in languages and belles lettres at Warrington Academy and again combined this with a position as a minister.

In 1767 Priestley left Warrington to become a minister for the Mill Hill Chapel in Leeds, a post with increased financial security, allowing Priestley to put the role of minister at the center of his life once again. In the county of his childhood Priestley was accepted by the liberal dissenting congregation where once he had experienced theological rejection. Of course, he also continued to teach and set up a series of classes of religious instruction for members of the chapel.

Suffering financially at Leeds, and keen to broaden his horizons, Priestley took up an offer to sail with James Cook to the South Seas as the ship's astronomer. However, the arrangement fell through, and after toying with the idea of moving to the colonies, Priestley finally, in 1773, took up residence in Calne, Wiltshire, in order to work in a varied and ill-defined role as Lord Shelburne's companion. Priestley was given a house for his growing family and a healthy salary; in return he acted as intellectual companion and political ally to Lord Shelburne. He practised many of his now famous experiments for Shelburne's guests, took over much of the education of his children and considerably expanded the library. Priestley was thus able to continue his role as a teacher, but he preached only occasionally.

His life with Shelburne was never as successful as either party had hoped, and in 1780 Priestley left the service with a good pension to become senior minister of the New Meeting in Birmingham, a large, wealthy and influential congregation. Priestley seems to have been very content in this role of minister, which he continued to see as the most important activity in his life. He also taught children from the congregation and established a number of Sunday schools that taught reading, writing and mathematics as well as religious tenets. However, these happy times did not last long. Priestley left Birmingham after his house and belongings were destroyed in the notorious Church and King riots of 1791. He moved the family to Hackney where they stayed until 1794. He succeeded Richard Price at the Gravel Pit meeting as morning preacher. Increasingly well known as a liberal political philosopher and theologian, Priestley was elected a citizen of France but declined an offer to be a representative to the National Convention.

Priestley faced continuing pressure and the fear of further riots while he lived in London. Significantly, he had to obtain official notice that he was not evading arrest before he could emigrate to the United States in 1794 where he hoped to find freedom and tolerance in the new world. Priestley lived in Pennsylvania until his death in 1804 in a house built in Northumberland and shared with his son Joseph and his family. Mary Priestley and their son Harry both died during this time, and Priestley's health slowly deteriorated. Priestley preached only occasionally in the following years but published much and continued to write until the day of his death, February 6th. That evening, although very ill, Priestley finished dictating some changes to some pamphlets. When these were complete he said "That is right; I have done now" and died just hours later (Autobiography 139).

d. Natural Philosophy

As a young teacher and minister in Nantwich, Priestley had acquired the basic apparatus needed for natural philosophy: an air pump and electrical machine used in lessons with the older pupils. As a tutor at Warrington, recently married, settled and part of a stimulating community, Priestley allowed his interest in natural philosophy to flourish.  After moving to Leeds Priestley continued to experiment with electricity and researched optics. Turning to pneumatic chemistry he published his Directions for Impregnating Water with Fixed Air in 1772.  The same year Priestley's Observations on Different Kinds of Air was published in the Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society. The paper was significant—Priestley had isolated nitric oxide, anhydrous hydrochloride and acid gases. It also introduced the ideas of eudiometry and photosynthesis. In 1773 Priestley won the Copley medal from the Royal Society.

Priestley used the resources provided by Shelburne at Calne to continue his experiments in pneumatic chemistry and published many of his findings. He isolated samples of what we would now call ammonia gas, nitrous oxide, nitrogen dioxide, sulphur dioxide and most notably oxygen. He also continued to investigate refraction, heat expansion, sound transmission of gases and photosynthesis. Priestley's scientific interests also found an outlet in Birmingham through his membership of the Lunar Society. Here he met many well-known scientists and businessmen including Erasmus Darwin, Josiah Wedgwood, Matthew Boulton and James Watt. Priestley also entered into a debate with Antoine Lavoisier about how best to interpret his experiments identifying oxygen.  He built a new laboratory and published more of his findings while living in the United States. Until his dying day, he stubbornly stuck to his phlogiston theory despite convincing arguments in favor of Lavoisier.

e. Portrayal, Reception and Legacy

Priestley was a man with a great deal to say but found it a struggle to speak and make himself understood. He stammered from early childhood, yet he followed a career demanding effective communication. His speech impediment caused him significant distress at school and at Daventry and contributed to his rejection at Needham where, he tells us, he found preaching "very painful" (Autobiography 80). Misunderstanding and miscommunication seem to be significant themes in Priestley's life. The ideas that he saw as reasonable and pleasing to God were received as dangerously revolutionary both in politics and theology. Although he regarded himself as a rational advocate of truth who wrote according to the respectable precepts of the doctrine of candor, his adversaries called him arrogant and incendiary. He advocated political, religious and intellectual freedom and the pursuit of truth through unfettered debate, yet he could be stubborn and uncompromising and believed in absolute truth. This led him into heated controversy and acrimonious debate despite his insistence that he simply wanted a frank exchange of opinions. Priestley was portrayed by his enemies as a dangerous radical with a political and religious philosophy that would undermine the moral and social order. In print and in cartoon Priestley was "gunpowder Joe," an explosive enemy of church authority, the truth of revealed religion and the political status quo.

2. Theology

We find a set of sophisticated religious and theological beliefs at the very heart of Priestley's intellectual and moral life, his career and politics, his social networks, behavior and sentiments. To understand Priestley's faith is to understand the central motivation for the majority of his published works.

a. Method

Priestley's most striking contribution to theological debate was his approach to the study of Christian scripture. He was one of a small group of Unitarian thinkers who devised a new translation of the Bible with the distinguishing feature that it should be in a state of continual improvement. Priestley had confidence in the project because he held that although truth itself was absolute and uniform, human attainment of truth was a fluid and gradual process. Knowledge must not be allowed to stagnate, and there was much work still to be done. At the heart of this slow progression toward absolute truth was Priestley's belief that all humanity could reach the perfect understanding attained by Christ.

Priestley argues that reason is a tool for the use of all humankind and that application of reason alone is enough to convince us of the existence of a unified, benevolent, creator God. The empirical evidences of natural religion and the precepts of rationality are God-given resources provided in order for us to understand the deity as a self-comprehending, omnipresent and omniscient being. However, other essential knowledge is not available through reason and natural religion alone. Revelation is also needed in order to teach us important lessons such as the proper use of prayer and other teachings of Jesus.

Priestley approached scriptural study extremely seriously because of the essential role of revealed religion. He tells us that rational evaluation of the Bible is the only way in which truth can be attained. He denounced all the mystery and irrationality of orthodox theology, denying the Trinity and the Atonement as examples of such muddled and disordered thought. Without mystery and without the need for unfounded faith the individual was free to interpret scripture by the light of reason. Only rational thought, good education and complete liberty of conscience were needed for understanding the words of revealed law in their plainest sense and as a coherent whole. This was open to all individuals who possessed the powers of reason and thus religious authority and the need for a clergy--seen by him as distant and elite--were undermined in one sweep.

Priestley also developed a critical method in his approach to scripture based on careful linguistic and historical study. He emphasized the highly figurative nature of the scriptures and argued that many misunderstandings were merely verbal, the result of taking ancient languages out of their cultural context. Furthermore, Priestley studied history in order to explain the ways in which Christianity had become corrupted over time as misunderstandings crept in, disfiguring the pure and simple beliefs of the early church.

b. Principal Ideas

i. Unitarianism

Application of his theological methods allowed Priestley to develop a set of religious beliefs which he regarded as highly rational and as close as possible to the pure Christianity of the early church. Already denying the Trinity, Priestley left Daventry Academy an Arian and tells us that it was after reading Nathaniel Lardner's Letter on the Logos of1759that he adopted the Unitarian creed he held for most of his adult life. Priestley argued that the notion of the Trinity is an essentially irrational tenet of an unquestioning faith. It requires a willingness to replace individual reason with trust in the teaching of church authorities whose power is perpetuated by ideas shrouded in superstition and mystery. He compared this belief to the simple idea of a unified God, a rational truth present in both natural and revealed religion. His historical work allowed Priestley to argue that the early Christians and Church Fathers were Unitarian and that belief in the Trinity was a corruption that had crept into scripture over the centuries. The Trinity slowly developed over time as gentile and heathen beliefs infiltrated simple "pristine" understanding of the unlearned. The most important message of the Old Testament, argues Priestley, is that God is unified and indivisible. In the New Testament, while the role of Jesus is essential, the Father is entirely exclusive of the Son. He tells us that when scripture appears to say that the Father, Son and the Holy Spirit are equally divine, the language is highly figurative and should not be read literally. This leaves Jesus as wholly human and the powers he possessed as those granted by God to an ordinary man. Christ has the power for resurrection and ascension, but he is not God, according to Priestley. He is not divine and should not be worshipped, despite being an object of our utmost respect.

ii. The Atonement

Priestley undermined the divinity of Jesus and in doing so deeply altered the whole interpretation of his death and resurrection. Priestley insisted that the death of Jesus was only a sacrifice in the figurative sense. His death was not a means by which the wrath of God had been diverted, and his sacrifice was not an atonement for sin. Jesus was not a divine mediator between God and humanity; he was a savior simply because his life was a demonstration of perfect moral duty and the truth of physical resurrection.

iii. Predestination

Priestley argued that the Calvinist notion of predestination was irrational and had only a flimsy basis in scripture. Arguing from utilitarian premises, Priestley writes that God's manifest plan is to produce the greatest happiness for his people; a system which condemns many to eternal torment and therefore produces exceptional misery cannot be part of this plan. Priestley was drawn to the idea of universal salvation, the only system to ensure the greatest happiness. He acknowledged the role of punishment as an important part of divine justice and even wrote that it should be long and severe in order to be effective. However, he could not accept that finite humans would be punished infinitely.

iv. Original Sin and Grace

The notion of grace that was prevalent among the clergy and orthodox believers was based on the idea of original sin pardoned by the death of Christ, a sacrifice for the sake of fallen humankind. Instead of believing in this idea of innate sinfulness and supernatural reconciliation, Priestley held that everyone had the potential to attain the perfect moral knowledge that Jesus had exemplified and taught. Part of this potential for perfection, writes Priestley, is that God has given us moral laws that we are perfectly capable of following. Although he concedes that everyday fallible humans are unlikely to be morally perfect, he contends that we can choose to lead a life pleasing to God and make constant effort to repent and change our behavior. He places this at the center of Christian life, rather than the emotional evangelical faith, the Calvinist "experience" or the fallacy of the death bed conversion. He tells us that it is not arrogance or pride which allows us to dismiss the idea of original sin and believe that all humankind can do what God tells us. It is simply the power that God has given to all of us. The idea that we are justified by faith or predestination diminishes this power that every person has to do the will of God.

v. The Soul

The metaphysical basis for Priestley's disavowal of the existence of the soul is explored in the section of this article on "Matter and Spirit." Priestley combined exploration of the nature of matter with scriptural study to argue for the unity of body and spirit, insisting on the biblical basis for a belief in physical resurrection. He writes that there is no scriptural basis for a split between body and soul. Not only is belief in the soul unreasonable based on the evidence around us, writes Priestley, it is also a belief which careful historical exploration shows was an idolatrous heathen tenet that crept into Christianity and slowly corrupted it.

vi. The Millennium

Priestley was a fervent millenarian, trusting in biblical prophecy and waiting for the second coming of Christ. He read widely on the millennium and placed himself within a well established scholarly tradition of millenarian study. Priestley was hopeful that he was living in the "last days" before the foretold return of Christ. Reading Daniel and Revelation, Priestley believed that the return of the Jews to their homeland would precede the glorious second coming and waited eagerly for such an event. He carefully watched worldwide political developments for signs that Christ's rule on earth was soon to begin, and it is likely that looking for such evidence that the bible contained absolute truths and tangible proofs of the existence of the deity appealed to Priestley's scientific mindset. The American Revolution seemed a good sign and his optimism intensified after the French Revolution and the Birmingham riots. At the end of his life Priestley became increasingly preoccupied with the millennium, putting a great deal of hope in the imminent arrival of Christ and studying scriptural prophecy in great detail.

c. Reactions and Criticisms

For Priestley there was an order, even a beauty, which stemmed from the process of obtaining truth through reason, and in the pure, rational and simple truth that this process revealed. Although his enemies called him "gunpowder Joe," his grains of gunpowder were no more than a series of necessarilyrelated ideas which, when marshaled by strict reason and controlled by rational thought, would always have the same outcome. However, to some of Priestley's Anglican opponents his reason-driven truth was subversive and seditious. He was accused of demolishing the foundations of revealed truth and, in consequence, of morality. They saw moral upheaval where Priestley saw rationality and order.

Contemporary reactions to Priestley's theological and religious works often involved in-depth scriptural analysis. This kind of discussion has been seen as less relevant today. Some secondary comment has focused on the interaction between Priestley's theological position and his political beliefs, often identifying interesting conceptual links. For example, J.C.D. Clark stated that theological heterodoxy and radicalism were ‘conceptually basic' (281). A.M.C. Waterman has added to the debate, arguing that although challenging the Trinity is enough to undermine the principle of subordination in church and society, there is no necessary link between dissent and subversive politics (Haakonssen 214). Other comment has examined Priestley's belief in miracles and biblical prophecy in light of his highly rational stance. For example, Martin Fitzpatrick asks us to consider whether Priestley's obsession with apocalyptic texts in his later life was the sign of an unbalanced mind (Fitzpatrick 1991 106). However, Clark-Garrett argues that, far from a weakness or drift in old age, Priestley's millenarian speculations were consistent with his overall outlook. His attention focused by the French Revolution, Priestley was simply using his scientific method to observe the unfolding patterns of Providence, and the fulfilment of prophecy was a key part of this search for facts and evidence to bolster his rational religion (53).

3. Politics and Political Philosophy

a. Principal Ideas

At the heart of Priestley's political philosophy lie the twin themes of progress and perfectibility. His work is shot-through with an optimism that arises from his unswerving belief in progress and a perfect future state. Priestley's work rests on an assumption that humankind will be better off in the future than it is at present and that society in the present is already more perfect than life in the past. Unlike brute animals who continue in the same way without change, human society is constantly in a state of development, change and improvement. He tells us of the happiness he experiences because of the realization that whatever the world was like at the beginning the end will be perfect and "paradisiacal." Importantly, mankind's unbounded potential for future development requires good government, and, going full circle, good government here means government conducive to progress.

Priestley conjectures a social contract to illustrate his ideas on liberty. He tells us of a group of unconnected individuals who lead separate lives. They are exposed to many wrongs and have few advantages. If the people voluntarily submit to join forces as part of a group they resign some of their natural liberty in return for protection, alliance and other advantages. Some liberty has to be given up just for the society to function. A large group of people would need representatives in order to make decisions on behalf of society and, although this may seem like a sacrifice of liberty, these men would act purely for the good of society and reflect the sentiments of the whole body. The only thing that gives them power is that they are there to act for the public good. Reason and conscience guide them and the people judge them.

Significantly, Priestley divides "natural" liberty into civil and political liberty after the contractual agreement. This is a distinction which Robert E. Schofield says was only commonplace after Mill and that Priestley felt was necessary for the sake of clarity (1997 210). Political liberty, Priestley tells us, is the power of holding or electing public office. It is the "right of magistracy," the power of the private opinion made public. Civil liberty is the power an individual has over their actions and only refers to their own conduct. It is the right to be exempt from the control of others.  Priestley tells us that when natural liberty is resigned upon entering into society, it is civil liberty that is relinquished for the sake of increased political liberty.

Once elaborated, Priestley's articulation of two types of liberty allows him to place his theory on utilitarian grounds. The good and happiness of the whole of society is made identical with the good and happiness of the majority of its members. Happiness, good and progress become inextricably linked within this theory, as Priestley had insisted that progress towards perfection is the ultimate goal for mankind and would result in unbounded happiness. He tells us that government is required to identify what is most conducive to progress, and therefore to happiness, and to eradicate barriers and limits to progress. For example, division of labor is useful and should be encouraged, as it aids the economy and increases knowledge. Specialization helps everyone reach their potential and means that the arts and sciences are likely to flourish. Meanwhile, progress is hindered by encroachments on civil liberty. Priestley was concerned that progress would stagnate if education and religion were not left free to flourish and reach perfection. He wrote against established religion and against state education, wary of uniformity and unnecessary authority. He insisted that diversity of opinion was essential for free debate and ultimate progress and therefore advocated complete religious liberty and freedom of speech.

b. Priestley and the Law

Although Priestley celebrated freedom and was concerned to limit government intervention for the sake of individual liberty, he did not have an antagonistic opinion of the law. Good government plays an important role within Priestley's philosophy, protecting liberty and rights but also serving as an active agent of change. Priestley's political philosophy has a psychological foundation based on the doctrine of association. Human perfection was to be achieved along associationist lines. Good government and society was crucial to this process. Government should explore what circumstances are most conducive to progress and happiness and apply these principles, even if this means intervening or limiting freedom to some extent.

c. Toleration and the Pursuit of Truth

Priestley's theology and his status as a dissenter informed much of his political work. At a political level Priestley was keen to speak on behalf of rational dissent and outline the political principles most often associated with Protestant dissent in general. Eager to inform the Anglican clergy of the political opinions to be found amongst their dissenting counterparts, Priestley writes that there is no reason to assume that dissenters are anarchists or republicans. The vast majority are peaceful, law-abiding and property-owning. He tells us that dissenters respect human authority in most matters, respect the government and support the Hanoverian succession. However, they do not recognize human authority in religion, seeing no spiritual or scriptural reason for church authority or established religion. The church has no business in civil government, and one of the many reforms required was a full separation of church and state, as well as a purging of other popish ways still left within the Church of England.

At a philosophical level, Priestley's demands for religious liberty were often for utilitarian reasons, recognizing the need for liberty in order to foster truth and aid progress. He was skilled in illustrating these abstract arguments with numerous historical examples to consolidate his case. Priestley did believe firmly in the absolute nature of divine truth, but he argued for full toleration for dissenters, Catholics and even atheists. This was because at the root of his call for toleration was a powerful conviction that to uncover divine truth should be the ultimate aim of all human endeavors, and this needed an atmosphere of free and unrestrained debate. Rational dissent held that truth arose from the application of human reason and conversely that unnecessary intervention could be extremely harmful. If laws were in place that stifled free discussion and forced belief in superstition or falsehood, the cause of truth was left in the dark

d. Reactions and Criticisms

Priestley's Essay on the First Principles of Government went swiftly through two editions and continued to be published throughout the nineteenth century. Clearly influential at the time, the work also had significant long-term impact. Jeremy Bentham acknowledged the Essay as the inspiration for his utilitarian "greatest happiness" principle. Although Bentham's famous words do not appear anywhere in the work of Priestley, it is fair to say that this is a significant legacy. However, in his own time, Priestley's work was met with criticism and attack. Priestley backed the campaign for the repeal of the test and corporation acts, and this provoked a huge conservative backlash fuelled in part by heightened reactionary fears following the French revolution. In this heated atmosphere, accusations of sedition and treason were common currency, and Priestley came under serious criticism for his political and theological views. Priestley's critics entangled religion and politics and made little attempt to identify Priestley's own first principles. Priestley was accused of attempting to undermine the authority of the church and the government. His political philosophy seemed dangerously egalitarian and his insistence on continual progress was a dangerous threat to the old order. Priestley's insistence on the importance of unfettered individual reason had dangerous consequences. His enemies explicitly stated that Priestley's concern for the truth had inverted the order of things. Priestley had destroyed the necessity for a separate Clergy and attacked the sacredness of their profession. By questioning the need for obedience and asserting the authority of the individual, it seemed to nervous minds that he had inverted the whole social hierarchy.

One way this division has manifested itself is in the interesting relationship between natural law and utility as it appears in Priestley's political philosophy. For example, both Margaret Canovan and Robert Schofield comment on the relationship as it appears in Priestley's Essay on the First Principles of Government (Canovan 1984, Schofield 1997 209). Schofield suggests that Priestley's brand of utilitarianism is significantly less relativist than Bentham's. While Bentham used the happiness principle as the only guiding force of government, Priestley never doubted that there was a perfect way of governing and that it was towards this that mankind should progress. Canovan also questions the idea that Priestley was a proto-Benthamite. She says that the underlying assumptions of the two men are significantly different. Priestley firmly believed in the existence of a benign and all powerful God who presided over a well-ordered and structured universe. So it was in this realm of natural law that Priestley's utilitarianism was supposed to operate. Priestley believed in the existence of an objective moral order so while happiness for Bentham could be whatever society or any individual decided it should be, happiness for Priestley was universal, fixed and could be evaluated in moral terms. While Bentham constructed a moral order from utilitarian grounds, Priestley simply used the principle in order to evaluate and discern moral laws. This places Priestley firmly in the natural law tradition. It allows him to use the language of rights as part of his political philosophy without compromising his utilitarianism.

The real extent of Priestley's liberalism is debated in a variety of different ways in the secondary literature. For example, Martin Fitzpatrick has highlighted that, while Priestley supported toleration whole-heartedly, this was because of his conviction that absolute truth would eventually prevail, rather than the pluralistic outlook of Richard Price (1982 18-23). Margaret Canovan has pointed out that, although Priestley is rightly remembered as a liberal, he often celebrated a paternalistic view of class relations (1983). Celebrating the bourgeois station, he stressed the importance of middle class charity to the poor, which would encourage their ambition and create useful social bonds. He also wrote that inequalities were part of God's plan for the present, despite his general support for social mobility. Isaac Kramnick has also pointed out this ‘ominous' side to Priestley's liberalism, examining the new layers of authority Priestley was prepared to impose on society in the name of progress and reform. Kramnick argues that the scientifically minded Priestley viewed the state as a kind of laboratory where intervention was required to perfect humankind, and so his thought is shot-through with a regard for authority and discipline (11, 20-22).

4. Association of Ideas

a. Principal Ideas

The principle of association states that ideas are generated from external sensations. Complex ideas are made up of simple ideas. These complex ideas are formed through repeated juxtaposition or "association" over time. This means that ideas become united in the mind so that one idea will be invariably followed by the other.

Hartley tells us that this principle has not escaped the notice of writers both ancient and modern but that it was John Locke who affixed the word "association" to the theory. Locke had argued that ideas are not innate but derived from experience. In mechanistic terms he explained the ways in which simple ideas become associated in experience and therefore build up complex ideas. Locke had posited a mind blank before experience of sense impressions had made their mark.  Hartley picked up this idea and added to it a physiological basis for the associationist theory, an idea that it was vibrations acting on the brain that laid down ideas and that when two vibrations occurred simultaneously over time they become associated in the mind. Hartley used Locke's epistemology but removed Locke's emphasis on reflection as a means to knowledge. Locke had written that all knowledge is based on sensation and then reflection. Hartley simply said that all types of ideas were derived from sensation. Priestley followed Hartley and dropped Locke's need for reflection as a distinct source of knowledge. Priestley also read the Rev. John Gay who had used Locke's associationist principle to argue against the innatist theory of morals of Francis Hutcheson. Gay had argued that morality and the passions were acquired through experience; as we attempt to avoid pain and seek pleasure our morals and passions are formed.

Enjoying debate and finding creativity in opposition, Priestley expounded his most coherent theory of association as an attack on the notion that innate common sense can stand above reason when it comes to religious belief. Published in 1774 Priestley's Examination of Dr. Reid's Inquiry...Dr. Beattie's Essay...and Dr. Oswald's Appeal is a harsh and rigorous refutation of common sense in favor of association. Like Hartley, Priestley was keen to make association the sole basis of human understanding. Hobbes had written of association as one means that certain ideas become linked by resemblance or causality. In contrast to Hobbes, Locke was more interested in unnaturally associated ideas, or when two things that have nothing in common end up united. However, for Priestley association was the foundation and excluded all other epistemological sources. This certainly ruled out what he took to be Reid's theory, that sensations are made into ideas by innate principles implanted by God, and it excluded the argument that sensations act on the passive matter of the brain and that innate instincts act to turn them into knowledge. Priestley writes that living is about experience. That something seems instinctive does not mean that it has not derived ultimately from external experience.

b. Links to Other Ideas

Associationism allowed Priestley to identify the general laws of human nature he was looking for and is therefore the basis for much of his metaphysical, educational and political writing, as well as informing his theology. For example, Priestley's work on the nature of matter enabled him to add a physiological basis to the doctrine of association. Once association was understood physiologically Priestley was able to argue against Cartesian dualism, against the existence of an immaterial soul, and in favor of the material unity of body and mind. In his political and educational philosophy the doctrine of association furnished Priestley with a means by which circumstances could be understood to shape the intellectual and moral life of individuals. This allows for progress in society and in the acquisition of knowledge because it allows for controlled change through experience. It gives teachers and legislators the power to shape others through altering circumstances or environment. Association consolidated Priestley's determinist doctrine of philosophical necessity as it allowed all actions to be traced back to motives and ideas formed entirely from experience and therefore potentially determined by Providence. Finally, association also appears in Priestley's theology. In the Institutes of Natural and Revealed Religion (1772) Priestley explains that revealed religion has followed the same pattern historically as an individual does when learning through association. The development from the Old Testament to the New is like the process of acquiring knowledge of pain and difficulty but also love of god and the pleasures of life as an individual.

c. Reactions and Criticisms

Priestley's devotion to the doctrine of association was one of the less controversial aspects of his thought. The system was already part of a respected tradition and Priestley's ideas were not especially innovative or shocking. However, the polemic feel of his attacks on Reid, Beattie and Oswald did provoke some sharp replies and Priestley actually issued an apology for the tone he had struck. Robert E. Schofield has argued that Priestley played a crucial role in maintaining Hartley's ideas, especially among the utilitarians, and therefore had an important influence on the nineteenth century. While late nineteenth-century associationist psychology is often regarded as the precursor to the behaviorism of the twentieth century, studying Priestley allows us to locate the ideas considerably further back (2004 52).

5. Matter and Spirit

a. Principal Ideas

Priestley wanted to elucidate a physiological theory to refute his interpretation of the Scottish "common sense" system of separate instinctive perceptions. Priestley writes that all sensations are the same. They arise from experience as vibrations in the brain. Priestley argued that this system offered a simplicity that the theory of separate and original instincts could not. An outside stimulus causes the brain to vibrate. For example, "seeing" is actually the result of vibrations of the optic nerve caused by light. Vibrations consisted of tiny movements of small particle, of the nerves and then of the brain. These movements were caused by the impressions made by external objects on any of the five senses.

Priestley tells us that all matter vibrates and that all matter can transmit these vibrations to our brains.  Following Hartley, Priestley tells us that once the brain has been made to vibrate a trace of that vibration is left behind. Hartley calls this a "vibratiuncle." Although Priestley cuts down on such technical terms the theory is the same. A "vibratiuncle" is laid down as a tendency for the brain to vibrate the same way again. If the initial vibration was strong or intense, then so too will be the vibratiuncle. If the vibration is weak or small, then the vibratiuncle too is weaker. If the vibration occurs many times, this has the same affect, strengthening the trace and increasing the tendency to vibrate. When two vibrations occur together they act on each other or modify each other so that, as they occur repeatedly together, they become associated in the brain. This association means that when one occurs the other will also occur. Vibrations can build up sets of vibratriuncles so that if only one vibrates, the others in the system will vibrate too. One occurrence triggers all of them.

This is the physiological basis of the associationist doctrine. It explains how sensations become ideas and how simple ideas can build up into complex ones through this process. While Hartley did acknowledge the parallel process between ideas and physiological vibrations, he was keen to leave room in his theory for the existence of an immaterial soul. Priestley lacked his caution and was driven to question the means by which a non-physical substance could act upon a physical one. While Hartley had left this a mystery and posited an "elementary substance" that was neither matter nor spirit but linked them both, Priestley's answer was to abandon any kind of dualism at all. He writes that our understanding is troubled simply because of the way in which matter appears to us. Superficially it seems solid and inert. However, Priestley tells us, experiments reveal that this is not the case. Matter is far from solid or impenetrable, it is made up of atoms and particles and these are subject to forces of attraction and repulsion depending on their arrangement. It is these forces that make matter seem solid. Matter had been assumed to be incapable of thought or perception because it was solid and not affected by outside forces. It was seen as inert, sluggish even, and therefore incompatible with the capacity for sensation. Now that this assumption had been undermined, it remained entirely possible that matter could form the basis for our mind and spirit as well as physical being.

When the matter of the brain was subject to vibrations and vibratriuncles, it was engaged in thought. Priestley does not tell us how vibrations become ideas. He admitted that, although he did not know how material substances think over and above this basic supposition, he argued that the possibility remained and that this scenario seemed more likely than the existence of separate and immaterial soul. The distinction between matter and spirit was therefore unnecessary and untrue. Priestley writes that his materialism leaves fewer questions unanswered than the notion of a soul. It prevents the need for speculation about how and why the soul leaves the body and how it may return, what happens to the soul before resurrection and how a soul comes to choose a certain body to start with. Priestley claimed he had resolved the problems of Cartesian dualism and the tricky distinction that had corrupted Christianity. He had redefined the nature of matter and made the composition of the body single and uniform.

b. Priestley, Newton and Boscovitch

Priestley's regard for Newtonian theory is communicated strongly in his works on matter and spirit. Robert E. Schofield has explained the ways in which Priestley's career can be seen as dedicated to the Newtonian idea of matter (1964 291-294). At the end of principia mathematica,IsaacNewton gives us a physical explanation for the association of ideas. Unlike John Locke, who was wary of looking for a physical basis of his idea of association, Newton used a theory of vibrations to explain how perception and memory are formed. Hartley then relied on Newton's idea of an elastic ether and the possibility for vibrating motions to occur within it. In the same way, it was Newtonian ideas about matter, that "solids" retain an impression when vibrations or forces act upon them, that allowed Priestley to explain the lasting affect of vibrations on the matter of the brain. Furthermore, it was Newton who had suggested that objects in the world cause light sensations which vibrate the optic nerve and allow us to "see," and it was a Newtonian desire to uncover simple, universal laws of explanation that linked Priestley's ideas on association and matter and spirit so neatly.

c. Theology

It is impossible to separate Priestley's metaphysical opinions about matter and spirit from his theology. His speculations on the nature of matter provided Priestley with scientific and physiological evidence to deny the existence of the soul. Some thinkers insisted that matter was inert and animated only by a God-given soul. Priestley's matter was different. It was not inert. Matter was complex and active. It was possible for the brain to be wholly material and also to vibrate and therefore to "think" rather than a passive vehicle moved by an immaterial soul. When Priestley examined the atheism of Baron d'Holbach he stated that it was one of the most convincing arguments he had come across. This was because d'Holbach shared some of his ideas on the nature of matter. However, d'Holbach held that forces of attraction and repulsion, gravity and electricity were simply the "energy of nature." Priestley said that this was another name for God, an energy which should be acknowledged as having intelligence and design. His continued faith meant that Priestley never relinquished scriptural study and examined the Bible in relation to his understanding of matter.

Priestley's reading of scripture convinced him that the idea of soul was actually a "corruption" of Christianity and that resurrection, when it occurred, was of a physical and not a spiritual nature. He attacked the dualism of Descartes but argued that the idea of an immaterial mind and soul was actually of ancient pagan origin, having crept into Christian belief and undermined "monist" Hebrew doctrines. His opinion on the material nature of the soul allowed him to explain the resurrection of matter and spirit as a single, material event.  Priestley argues from scripture alongside his exploration of matter. He writes that the idea of the soul only appears in some badly interpreted and unconnected passages of the bible and that, if such duality had actually been part of God's design, it would have been revealed with clarity. Priestley insisted that removing this corruption from our understanding of scripture would strengthen the foundations of revealed religion and lead to stronger, rational, belief. While the notion of the soul had debased the whole idea of resurrection, Priestley believed his materialist ideas explained the process by which the body would die and decompose, only to be recomposed and physically restored to immortality through the power of the divine.

d. Reactions and Criticisms

Robert E. Schofield has shown evidence that Michael Faraday had read Priestley and claims that British scientists showed so much interest in Boscovichian atomism because Priestley had advocated his ideas (2004 71-72). Boscovich's own reaction was more typical. He was absolutely furious that Priestley had reduced his ideas to materialism. Other commentators were similarly outraged. Priestley's edition of Hartley came under severe criticism and his further publications on the subject heightened the controversy. Materialism was feared by many; it could easily slip into atheism. The theological speculations that accompanied Priestley's metaphysics were regarded with suspicion and met with outright anger.

Joseph Berington, a Roman Catholic, and the Anglican Bishop Samuel Horsley both penned fierce refutations of Priestley's works on the nature of matter and spirit. His ideas provoked vitriol from a wide variety of believers. A respectful debate with Richard Price reveals the extent to which Priestley's ideas were a challenge even to other rational dissenters. Price refused to agree that matter was not inert. For him, matter was solid and could not be imbued with sensation or perception. Matter was subject to forces such as gravity but only because God had added these properties onto matter; they were not innate. Price argued strongly in favor of the existence of the soul. He said that although he did not see the body as something corrupt and something that trapped the soul, he did think that there was an immaterial part of the body and that this needed a link to the physical body in order to exercise certain powers. He saw two separate substances connected and dependent but distinct. Priestley's engagement with such a diverse selection of critics served to ensure that his views on matter and spirit would become infamous and added to his reputation as an idiosyncratic, controversial and even dangerous figure.

6. Philosophical Necessity

a. Principal Ideas

Priestley writes that he published his principle work on philosophical necessity out of concern for the ambiguous definitions of liberty and necessity. He tightened the meaning of these words and argued that, under the system of philosophical necessity, everyone is free; everyone is entirely at liberty to do anything they will as long as there are no external constraints. So all people can think whatever they chose and act however they chose. However, everyone is also operating under divine necessity. Everyone is bound by causal laws fixed by God and directed by him for the ultimate good of all humanity. This means that there is no way that two different events, decisions or acts can occur when the circumstances are exactly identical. Provided the circumstances are identical, there is only one possible outcome. This removes any possibility for random occurrences and eliminates all chance. No room is left for the possibility of variation. Everything becomes part of an entirely determined chain of causes and effects.

Priestley asserts that when most people examine their views on free will, they will see that those ideas actually fit better into his system of philosophical necessity than they immediately realize. Once liberty and necessity are properly understood, he writes, they are actually compatible with each other. It is chance or randomness that is incompatible with freedom or voluntary action. Priestley puts it in terms of motives for acting. He says that throughout nature there are fixed, unalterable laws. David Hume had said that every cause and effect is just a conjunction; the connection could be arbitrary. The cause and effect may appear to be linked, but there is no way of knowing for sure that they are. Priestley, on the other hand, was keen to refute Hume. He said there is an invariable connection between cause and effect. Furthermore, in the case of human choice and action, the cause is often a motive. If one has a state of mind and then acts, the same action will occur again if the state of mind is unaltered. The choice made is voluntary, but the motives that led to that choice form part of an unbroken necessary chain of causes and events.

Priestley also discusses the role of God within this system in more detail. He tells us that God knows everything, but he would not be able to foresee contingent events--this alone eradicates the possibility of contingency and consolidates Priestley's determinist position. Aware of the controversial conclusions of this position, Priestley admits that this means that God is the author of sin. However, as God determines everything for the ultimate good, vice and bad behavior are in fact part of a greater divine plan to bring humankind to perfection. Priestley was careful to distinguish this system of necessity from the predestination of Calvinism. Calvinists held that God uses supernatural methods in order to bring about change and chooses an elect few for salvation. Priestley's God worked naturally through a string of necessary causes and effects only, and although sinners would be punished, Providence did not allow for eternal damnation.

Priestley's ideas on determinism and providence were not new. He cites Hobbes and Hartley as major influences, as well as drawing from Locke and Hume. What is more interesting here is the extent to which these ideas were part of a personal journey for Priestley. He tells us that it is his happiness to find a resolution to his anxieties that motivated him to publish on the subject. The security and satisfaction that comes from contemplating every event as part of the divine plan of Providence gave Priestley his characteristic optimism and self-assurance. It was this that he was keen to make known to the public.

b. Links to Other Ideas

Philosophical necessity works well with Priestley's idea of matter. Priestley had insisted that the human body and spirit were both physical. As matter is subject to the universal or unchanging laws of nature, it follows that no decision in the mind or act in the body can be random or spontaneous.

Philosophical necessity and the association of ideas are also closely related. Priestley acknowledged the importance of human will and the sense that this was free. Association explained how the will was created. All motives were part of a causal chain of associated ideas. Basil Willey has argued that it is the associationist foundation of philosophical necessity that means it promotes moral behavior (171-174). Priestley posited a universe created by God in which vice is less attractive than virtue in terms of the rewards it brings. Although physical pleasure and sin bring short term benefits, it is more compelling in the long term to follow a virtuous path. According to his system, it is possible for people to change their motives and their circumstances and therefore to alter their behavior for the positive. This suffuses the necessarian doctrine with human agency. It means that humankind cannot simply sit back and let Providence take its course. We may be instruments of God, but in understanding that our own motives and choices are part of a chain of cause and effect, we can act to alter them and become more virtuous. Although all events are determined and God is the ultimate author of sin, on a day-to-day level we have freedom to shun vice and chose virtue. Unlike God, humankind does not have the power to use sin and wrongdoing for the sake of good, and therefore we must chose to live virtuous lives.

Finally, understanding philosophical necessity is important in order to get to grips with Priestley's notions of reward and punishment. Priestley spends a lot of time writing about the ways in which necessity is the only system that allows punishment to make rational sense. A person acts because of a set of motives, these are caused by circumstances. Therefore circumstances and motives can be altered. There is no reason to punish behavior is if it not caused and not based on a rational intention

c. Reactions and Criticisms

Priestley entered into a number of debates concerning his determinism including a long and respectful debate with Richard Price. Price argued that free-will was essential in order to ensure that we take responsibility for our choices and actions before God. He added that a determined system was less of an achievement of creation than the reality of human freedom God had granted. Priestley was aware of the accusation that the system of philosophical necessity removed any imperative towards moral behavior. Although he tried to address this by arguing that on an everyday level all people can chose to act or not to act. He used his associationist theory to explain that people could actively change their circumstances in order to alter their motives over time. Most contemporary and modern commentators have pointed out that this has the feeling of a clever paradox. Robert E. Schofield calls it "sophistry" and Basil Willey has pointed out that the liberty granted to humankind under Priestley's system of philosophical necessity is free will under a different name (Willey 171-174, Schofield 2004 79).

7. Philosophy of Education, History and Linguistics

a. Principal Ideas

In his educational works, Priestley tells us that the education provided at dissenting academies and universities is often ill-suited to the young men in attendance. The curriculum provided did not prepare them for a civil and active life. He emphasized that the traditional subjects, such as philosophy, mathematics and logic, were important but could not alone fit a young mind for work in anything but the clergy and learned professions. Instead he wanted to educate a generation that was destined for a life of commerce and for magistrates, lawyers, powerful merchants, statesmen and even the landed. The broad liberal education that Priestley recommended was to turn out useful liberal minds from among the middle classes and included modern history, law, economics and the arts. He also turned his attention to women, refuting the notion that they were intellectually inferior and arguing that many women would need to subsist alone and should be given the tools to do so. Women were moral creatures just like men, and as education was the basis of morality their exclusion was counter to Priestley's hopes of progress and perfection. Priestley's attitude to the education of the poor was less enthusiastic. His liberalism meant that he stood against state education but did not extend his interest in a more positive direction.

Priestley's educational philosophy was based on his metaphysics. It is a fine example of the ways in which he brought associationism, materialism and philosophical necessity together in practical ways. Priestley thought that all knowledge, intellect, perception and memory were acquired through sensory experience and that simple ideas combined into complex ideas through association. This mechanism was entirely material and therefore based on necessary causal laws which could be identified and manipulated. It was important because any two ideas could be associated together to control the environment of children so that they were exposed to the most useful and virtuous associations. Denying any chance that knowledge or morality is innate put extra emphasis on the importance of environment, especially when minds were young and malleable and the potential for progress and perfection was at its peak.  Priestley's optimism now had a practical outlet. It was up to the educator, whose actions had a sole and necessary effect on children, to prepare the next generation for virtue and improvement that could be unlimited.

Priestley was careful to prepare a curriculum which would optimize healthy physical, moral and intellectual development, and this meant using the theory of association to design learning aids and make practical recommendations. Association meant that the most useful learning involved natural discussions and digressions and that experience rather than theory was always to be more memorable. Priestley's ideal lessons involved question and answer sessions and group discussions. Both sides of a controversy were to be understood and all queries and objections brought to light. Priestley was keen on the use of mechanical aids in teaching, such as his successful charts of history and biography. He wanted to convey knowledge in an ordered and regular manner so that it was easily learned and remembered.

b. History and Language

Priestley made significant contribution to the development of a modern curriculum. His philosophical work was enriched by his experience as a teacher. Priestley put together a philosophy of history and a linguistic theory while preparing lectures for publication. For Priestley, history was a useful practical tool. It appealed to him because it could be used to demonstrate God's divine purpose and could be observed in order to understand political and economic developments more fully. Priestley writes that history is like the experiments made by the air pump or electrical machine. It demonstrates the workings of nature and God and therefore provides the foundations for theoretical speculation. Like personal experience, history was a swifter teacher than abstract ideas. It allowed one to assemble the evidences of the divine plan and unveiled the plans of Providence. History could increase our understanding of God and the ways in which he used short-term suffering for the greater good; that which appeared evil was actually essential for progress and would terminate in the perfection of humanity.

Priestley hoped that to view history in this way would increase virtue and piety in the minds of his pupils and infuse all with a sense of optimism. He also wanted to encourage his students to see history as a laboratory, where all manner of political systems had been tried and tested. It provided the data needed for sound political philosophy. A liberal government, unfettered thought and belief and free trade could be seen historically to stimulate progress. Furthermore, accurate study of all aspects of the past, from domestic lives to warfare, would increase knowledge of humanity and therefore help future advancements. This meant that Priestley advocated the study of modern history including arts, language, food, clothing, manners and sentiments. He extended the number of sources traditionally seen as relevant to historical study to include material evidence such as coins, medals, inscriptions, fortifications and town plans.

Alongside history Priestley had a long standing fascination with linguistics, and over the course of life as a teacher developed a coherent philosophy of language. He stressed the importance to teaching language and insisted his student be well educated in the vernacular. He tells us that English is as vital as Latin, adding that it is a serious defect in any gentleman not to be able to read and write well in his own language. Priestley made a number of contributions to the study of English grammar, and his influence in the field extended well into the nineteenth century. As part of his grammatical work, Priestley highlighted the importance of understanding that language is in a continual process of development and that the only really useful standard by which to establish rules of language was to look at custom and usage.

These observations were part of a broader theory of language development. Priestley tells us that language is human, not a direct gift from God. It grows up slowly as words gain meaning through association, first simple words and then more complicated constructs. It develops slowly and irregularly and its symbols are arbitrary and often subject to changes of use and meaning. This means that, in order to translate accurately and fully understand the languages of the past, careful cultural study is needed in order to furnish us with enough information to understand meaning and usage. Individual language acquisition to some extent mirrors this process. Young children grasp the meaning of words through constant association between object and word. Furthermore, Priestley tells us that the association of ideas is important for understanding the impact of language, especially figurative language, on the mind. Words can trigger whole strings of associations based on both cultural and individual experience.

c. Reactions and Criticisms

Priestley's publications on education were generally well received at the time and ran into many editions. Modern commentators, however, have highlighted concern that Priestley used his status as a historian and educator to propagate his Unitarian theology. Arthur Sheps says that history was often written for "pugnacious and apologetic" reasons and that being a historian was a way of gaining moral authority. Priestley gained a historical reputation and was then able to use it to provide evidence for his scriptural exegesis (Belleguic 149). John McLachlan goes even further. He sees Priestley as someone whose religious belief overruled his more rational pursuits. He let a hopeful optimism in the workings of Providence get in the way of careful historical thinking (260).

8. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

i. Theology

Priestley's first religious publications grew out of his role as a teacher of youth while employed as a minister at Leeds. In 1767 he published A Catechism for Children and Young Persons and followed this in 1772 with A Scripture Catechism, consisting of a Series of Questions, with References to the Scriptures instead of Answers. Although these early works were intended to lay down the basics rather than spark doctrinal controversy, hints of Priestley's unorthodox views creep through the conventional veneer. In 1772 Priestley published his Institutes of Natural and Revealed Religion, a long and detailed exposition of the central beliefs of rational dissent, drawn from a variety of rational and liberal theologians. Many of Priestley's works contain a similar emphasis on summarizing and streamlining the views of other thinkers, such as A Free Address to Protestant Dissenters on the Subject of the Lord's Supper (1768) and Considerations on Differences of Opinion among Christians (1769).These formed part of a plethora of publications answering his already fierce critics, and Priestley continued to court controversy when he published An Appeal to the Serious and Candid professors of Christianity in 1770. Many answers and many replies followed, and the same opinions were repeated in Familiar Illustration (1772).

In 1768 Priestley established the Theological Repository,a theological journal with lofty aims to further truth through unfettered and candid debate. This allowed Priestley to rewrite some of his now familiar arguments under a variety of pseudonyms, while his long-running series of Letters to a Philosophical Unbeliever gave him space to challenge the views of those whose faith had been lost through the reading of modern philosophers. With strong leaning towards historical modes of arguments and an interest in the history of early Christianity, Priestley published his 1777 A Harmony of the Evangelists, in Greek,followed by a version in English in 1780. Other important historical studies include Priestley's History of the Corruptions of Christianity,first published in 1782, and An History of Early Opinions concerning Jesus Christ in 1786. In the 1790s and following his emigration, Priestley continued to defend his heterodox opinions on the Trinity with his Defences of Unitarianism series and the 1795 Unitarianism Explained and Defended, and he showed an increasing interest in biblical prophecy and the impending millennium, for example in his 1794 The Present State of Europe Compared with Antient Prophecies.

ii. Politics and Political Philosophy

In 1768 Priestley published his Essay on the First Principles of Government. Widely read and well regarded, the Essay was Priestley's first political publication. The following year Priestley published a pamphlet, The Present State of Liberty in Great Britain and her colonies, which reiterated many of the concerns grappled with in the Essay. 1769 also saw the publication of three works dealing with Protestant dissent, each addressed to liberal dissenters themselves or intended to inform others about their principles. In 1787 Priestley again entered political terrain with An Account of a Society for encouraging the Industrious Poor,in which his liberal individualism was more than obvious. Many of Priestley's political publications are evidence of the close link between his politics and theology. In 1769 he published Considerations on Church Authority, A View of the Principles and Conduct of Protestant Dissenters and A Free Address to Protestant Dissenters as such,all of which highlight the influence of Priestley's theology on his political philosophy. Priestley also wrote on religious liberty in An Address to Protestant Dissenters... on the Approaching Election of Members of Parliament and overviewed current arguments in favor of toleration for his patron Lord Shelburne in 1773. In 1780 Priestley controversially came out in favor of toleration for Roman Catholics, and again stirred up trouble a decade later by entering the vitriolic debate on the repeal of the Test and Corporation Acts, with letters to Pitt and Burke and a defense of his opinions addressed to the people of Birmingham.

iii. Association of Ideas

We first encounter Priestley's associationist opinions in his Institutes of Natural and Revealed Religion, which he began writing while still at Daventry and published in three volumes between 1772 and 1774. The Institutes and a number of later publications on the same topicinclude an attack on the principles of the common sense philosophy of Oswald, Reid and Beattie. The theme is continued in Priestley's edition of Hartley's Observations on Man in 1775, where Priestley cut out much of Hartley's work on physiology and theology in order to concentrate solely on expounding the doctrine of associationism.

iv. Matter and Spirit

David Hartley had vigorously denied accusations of materialism, but Priestley's own monist views emerged first in his edition of Hartley's Observations on Man in 1775. Although he removed some of Hartley's physiological exploration and theological concerns, Priestley appended a number of essays to his edition of the work that took Hartley's doctrine of vibrations and its materialist implications much further than the author would have liked. In 1777 Priestley set out to elucidate and defend his ideas on the unity of body and soul in his Disquisitions relating to Matter and Spirit,causing further offense and controversy. The following year, Priestley engaged in an exchange with Richard Price in which he defended his view of matter as capable of thought and perception and his disbelief in the existence of a nonphysical soul.

v. Philosophical Necessity

Priestley's interest in the determinist philosophy he called "philosophical necessity" emerges first in his Institutes of Natural and Revealed Religion,where Priestley's utilitarianism entails the direct intervention of a divine Providence in order to ensure that all suffering is ultimate good and the unhappiness of a few will always benefit the majority. The doctrine also plays a crucial part in his Examination of the Scottish common sense philosophers and his Disquisitions.... In 1777 Priestley outlined and defined these ideas in a work dedicated to the system, the Doctrine of Philosophical Necessity Illustrated.

vi. Philosophy of Education, History and Linguistics

Priestley's ideas on education emerge first in his Essay on the First Principles of Government, which actually took form out of his remarks on a well known code of education. In 1765, while working as a tutor at Warrington, he published a major work, the Essay on a Course of Liberal Education. In 1778 the Miscellaneous Observations Relating to Education outlined this syllabus in detail. In his 1788 Lectures on History and General Policy,Priestley's thoughts on education are elucidated with clarity and, along with his published syllabuses, lectures and teaching aids, the work allow us valuable insight into his educational philosophy. Priestley also produced teaching aids: a Chart of Biography in 1765 and New Chart of History in 1769, which used timelines to illustrate the major figures and time periods in history. Some of Priestley's earliest publications were about language and grew from his post as tutor of languages and belles-lettres at Warrington. In 1761 Priestley published The Rudiments of English Grammar,and this was followed a year later by A Course of Lectures on the Theory of Language and Universal Grammar. Priestley was an influential grammarian, and his publications were widely read and well received; he is notable for his emphasis on custom and usage as the most useful standards by which to assess correct language. In 1777 his Course of Lectures on Oratory and Criticism explored rhetoric, style and taste, introducing the importance of psychology and human nature as the means by which to understand these aspects of language.

b. General Secondary Sources

  • Priestley, Joseph. Autobiography of Joseph Priestley. Bath: Adams and Dart, 1970.
  • Schofield, Robert E. The Enlightenment of Joseph Priestley: A Study of his Life and Work from 1733-1773. Pennsylvania: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1997.
  • Schofield, Robert E. The Enlightened Joseph Priestley: A Study of His Life and Work from 1773-1804. Pennsylvania: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 2004.
  • Truman Schwartz, and John McEvoy, eds. Motion toward perfection: The Achievement of Joseph Priestley. Boston MA: Unitarian Universalist Association, 1990.
  • Willey, Basil. The Eighteenth-Century Background. Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1962.

i. Theology

  • Brooks, Marilyn. "Priestley's Plan for a Continually Improving Translation of the Bible." Enlightenment and Dissent 15 (1996): 89-106.
  • Clark, Jonathan C.D. English Society, 1688-1832: Ideology, Social Structure and Political Practice during the Ancien Regime. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.
  • Fitzpatrick, Martin. "Joseph Priestley, politics and ancient prophecy." Enlightenment and Dissent 10 (1991): 104-109.
  • Fruchtman, Jack. "The Apocalyptic Politics of Richard Price and Joseph Priestley: A Study in Late Eighteenth-Century English Republican Millennialism." Transactions of the American Philosophical Society 4 (1983):
  • Garrett, Clarke. "Joseph Priestley, the Millennium and the French Revolution." Journal of the History of Ideas 34. 1 (1973): 51-66.
  • Haakonssen, Knud, ed. Enlightenment and Religion: Rational Dissent in Eighteenth-Century Britain. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

ii. Politics

  • Canovan, Margaret. "Paternalistic Liberalism: Joseph Priestley on Rank and Inequality." Enlightenment and Dissent 2 (1983): 23-37.
  • Canovan, Margaret. "The Un-Benthamite Utilitarianism of Joseph Priestley." Journal of the History of Ideas 45. 3 (1984): 435-450.
  • Fitzpatrick, Martin. "Toleration and Truth." Enlightenment and Dissent 1 (1982): 3-31.
  • Kramnick, Isaac. "Eighteenth-Century Science and Radical Social Theory: The case of Joseph Priestley's Scientific Liberalism." The Journal of British Studies 25. 1 (1986): 1-30.

iii. Association of Ideas

  • Bowen Oberg, Barbara. "David Hartley and the Association of Ideas." Journal of the History of Ideas 37. 3 (1976): 441-454.
  • Faurot. JH. "Reid's Answer to Joseph Priestley." Journal of the History of Ideas 39. 2 (1978): 285-292.
  • Kallich, Martin. "The Association of Ideas and Critical Theory: Hobbes, Locke, and Addison." ELH 12. 4 (1945): 290-315.

iv. Matter and Spirit

  • Schofield, Robert E. "Joseph Priestley, the Theory of Oxidation and the Nature of Matter." Journal of the History of Ideas 25. 2 (1964): 285-294.
  • Schofield, Robert E. "Monism, Unitarianism and Phlogiston in Joseph Priestley's Natural Philosophy." Enlightenment and Dissent 19 (2000): 78-90.
  • Laboucheix, Henri. "Chemistry, Materialism and Theology in the Work of Joseph Priestley." Price-Priestley Newsletter 1 (1977): 31-48.

v. Philosophical Necessity

  • Fitzpatrick, Martin. " ‘In the Glass of History': The Nature and Purpose of Historical Knowledge in the Thought of Joseph Priestley." Enlightenment and Dissent 17 (1998): 172-209.
  • Harris, James A. "Joseph Priestley and the ‘Proper Doctrine of Philosophical Necessity." Enlightenment and Dissent 20 (2001): 23-44.
  • Hatch, Ronald B. " Joseph Priestley: An Addition to Hartley's Observations." Journal of the History of Ideas 36. 3 (1975): 548-550.

vi. Education

  • Belleguic, Thierry ed. Representations of Time in Eighteenth-Century London. London Ont.:  Academic Printing and Publishing,1999.
  • McLachlan, John. "Joseph Priestley and the study of History." Transactions of the Unitarian Historical Society 19. 4 (1990): 452-463.
  • Watts, Ruth. "Joseph Priestley and Education." Enlightenment and Dissent 2 (1983): 83-100.

Author Information

Elizabeth Kingston
University of Sussex
Great Britain

Adam Smith (1723—1790)

Smith_AdamAdam Smith is often identified as the father of modern capitalism. While accurate to some extent, this description is both overly simplistic and dangerously misleading. On the one hand, it is true that very few individual books have had as much impact as his An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations. His accounts of the division of labor and free trade, self-interest in exchange, the limits on government intervention, price, and the general structure of the market, all signify the moment when economics transitions to the "modern." On the other hand, The Wealth of Nations, as it is most often called, is not a book on economics. Its subject is "political economy," a much more expansive mixture of philosophy, political science, history, economics, anthropology, and sociology. The role of the free market and the laissez-faire structures that support it are but two components of a larger theory of human interaction and social history.

Smith was not an economist; he was a philosopher. His first book, The Theory of Moral Sentiments, sought to describe the natural principles that govern morality and the ways in which human beings come to know them. How these two books fit together is both one of the most controversial subjects in Smith scholarship and the key to understanding his arguments about the market and human activity in general. Historically, this process is made more difficult by the so-called "Adam Smith Problem," a position put forth by small numbers of committed scholars since the late nineteenth century that Smith's two books are incompatible. The argument suggests that Smith's work on ethics, which supposedly assumed altruistic human motivation, contradicts his political economy, which allegedly assumed egoism. However, most contemporary Smith scholars reject this claim as well as the description of Smith's account of human motivation it presupposes.

Smith never uses the term "capitalism;" it does not enter into widespread use until the late nineteenth century. Instead, he uses "commercial society," a phrase that emphasizes his belief that the economic is only one component of the human condition. And while, for Smith, a nation's economic "stage" helps define its social and political structures, he is also clear that the moral character of a people is the ultimate measure of their humanity. To investigate Smith's work, therefore, is to ask many of the great questions that we all struggle with today, including those that emphasize the relationship of morality and economics. Smith asks why individuals should be moral. He offers models for how people should treat themselves and others. He argues that scientific method can lead to moral discovery, and he presents a blueprint for a just society that concerns itself with its least well-off members, not just those with economic success. Adam Smith's philosophy bears little resemblance to the libertarian caricature put forth by proponents of laissez faire markets who describe humans solely as homo economicus. For Smith, the market is a mechanism of morality and social support.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Influences
    1. Early Life and Influences
    2. Smith's Writings
  2. The Theory of Moral Sentiments
    1. Sympathy
    2. The Impartial Spectator
    3. Virtues, Duty, and Justice
  3. An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations
    1. Wealth and Trade
    2. History and Labor
    3. Political Economy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Work by Smith
    2. Companion Volumes to the Glasgow Edition
    3. Introductions and Works for a General Audience
    4. Recommended Books for Specialists

1. Life and Influences

a. Early Life and Influences

Adam Smith was born in June, 1723, in Kirkcaldy, a port town on the eastern shore of Scotland; the exact date is unknown. His father, the Comptroller and Collector of Customs, died while Smith's mother was pregnant but left the family with adequate resources for their financial well being. Young Adam was educated in a local parish (district) school. In 1737, at the age of thirteen he was sent to Glasgow College after which he attended Baliol College at Oxford University. His positive experiences at school in Kirkcaldy and at Glasgow, combined with his negative reaction to the professors at Oxford, would remain a strong influence on his philosophy.

In particular, Smith held his teacher Francis Hutcheson in high esteem. One of the early leaders of the philosophical movement now called the Scottish Enlightenment, Hutcheson was a proponent of moral sense theory, the position that human beings make moral judgments using their sentiments rather than their "rational" capacities. According to Hutcheson, a sense of unity among human beings allows for the possibility of other-oriented actions even though individuals are often motivated by self-interest. The moral sense, which is a form of benevolence, elicits a feeling of approval in those witnessing moral acts. Hutcheson opposed ethical egoism, the notion that individuals ought to be motivated by their own interests ultimately, even when they cooperate with others on a common project.

The term "moral sense" was first coined by Sir Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury, whose work Smith read and who became a focal point in the Scots' discussion, although he himself was not Scottish. Although Shaftesbury did not offer a formal moral sense theory as Hutcheson did, he describes personal moral deliberation as a "soliloquy," a process of self-division and self-examination similar in form to Hamlet's remarks on suicide. This model of moral reasoning plays an important role in Smith's books.

The Scottish Enlightenment philosophers, or the literati, as they called themselves, were a close-knit group who socialized together and who read, critiqued, and debated each other's work. They met regularly in social clubs (often at pubs) to discuss politics and philosophy. Shortly after graduating from Oxford, Smith presented public lectures on moral philosophy in Edinburgh, and then, with the assistance of the literati, he secured his first position as the Chair of Logic at Glasgow University. His closest friendship in the group—and probably his most important non-familial relationship throughout his life—was with David Hume, an older philosopher whose work Smith was chastised for reading while at Oxford.

Hume was believed to be an atheist, and his work brought into question some of the core beliefs in moral philosophy. In particular, and even more so than Hutcheson, Hume's own version of moral sense theory challenged the assumption that reason was the key human faculty in moral behavior. He famously asserted that reason is and ought to be slave to the passions, which means that even if the intellect can inform individuals as to what is morally correct, agents will only act if their sentiments incline them to do so. An old proverb tells us that you can lead a horse to water but that you can't make it drink. Hume analogously argues that while you might be able to teach people what it means to be moral, only their passions, not their rational capacities, can actually inspire them to be ethical. This position has roots in Aristotle's distinction between moral and intellectual virtue.

Smith, while never explicitly arguing for Hume's position, nonetheless seems to assume much of it. And while he does not offer a strict moral sense theory, he does adopt Hume's assertion that moral behavior is, at core, the human capacity of sympathy, the faculty that, in Hume's account, allows us to approve of others' characters, to "forget our own interest in our judgments," and to consider those whom "we meet with in society and conversation" who "are not placed in the same situation, and have not the same interest with ourselves" (Hume: Treatise, book 3.3.3).

b. Smith's Writings

Smith echoes these words throughout A Theory of Moral Sentiments. In this book, he embraces Hume's conception of sympathy, but rejects his skepticism and adds, as we shall see, a new theory of conscience to the mix. However, focusing on Hume's observations also allow us to see certain other themes that Smith shares with his Scottish Enlightenment cohort: in particular, their commitment to empiricism. As with most of the other Scottish philosophers, Hume and Smith held that knowledge is acquired through the senses rather than through innate ideas, continuing the legacy of John Locke more so than René Descartes. For Hume, this epistemology would bring into question the connection between cause and effect—our senses, he argued, could only tell us that certain events followed one another in time, but not that they were causally related. For Smith, this meant a whole host of different problems. He asks, for example, how a person can know another's sentiments and motivations, as well as how members can use the market to make "rational" decisions about the propriety of their economic activity.

At the core of the Scottish project is the attempt to articulate the laws governing human behavior. Smith and his contemporary Adam Ferguson are sometimes credited with being the founders of sociology because they, along with the other literati, believed that human activities were governed by discoverable principles in the same way that Newton argued that motion was explainable through principles. Newton, in fact, was a tremendous influence on the Scots' methodology. In an unpublished essay on the history of astronomy, Smith writes that Newton's system, had "gained the general and complete approbation of mankind," and that it ought to be considered "the greatest discovery that ever was made by man." What made it so important? Smith describes it as "the discovery of an immense chain of the most important and sublime truths, all closely connected together, by one capital fact, of the reality of which we have daily experience" (EPS, Astronomy IV.76).

While Smith held the chair of logic at Glasgow University, he lectured more on rhetoric than on traditional Aristotelian forms of reasoning. There is a collection of student lecture notes that recount Smith's discussions of style, narrative, and moral propriety in rhetorical contexts. These notes, in combination with his essay on astronomy, offer an account of explanation that Smith himself regarded as essentially Newtonian. According to Smith, a theory must first be believable; it must soothe anxiety by avoiding any gaps in its account. Again, relying upon a basically Aristotelian model, Smith tells us that the desire to learn, and the theories that result, stems from a series of emotions: surprise at events inspires anxieties that cause one to wonder about the process. This leads to understanding and admiration of the acts and principles of nature. By showing that the principles governing the heavens also govern the Earth, Newton set a new standard for explanation. A theory must direct the mind with its narrative in a way that both corresponds with experience and offers theoretical accounts that enhance understanding and allow for prediction. The account must fit together systematically without holes or missing information; this last element—avoiding any gaps in the theory—is, perhaps, the most central element for Smith, and this model of philosophical explanation unifies both his moral theories and his political economy.

As a young philosopher, Smith experimented with different topics, and there is a collection of writing fragments to compliment his lecture notes and early essays. These include brief explorations of "Ancient Logics," metaphysics, the senses, physics, aesthetics, the work of Jean-Jacque Rousseau, and other assorted topics. Smith's Scottish Enlightenment contemporaries shared an interest in all of these issues.

While the works offer a glimpse into Smith's meditations, they are by no means definitive; few of them were ever authorized for publication. Smith was a meticulous writer and, in his own words, "a slow a very slow workman, who do and undo everything I write at least half a dozen of times before I can be tolerably pleased with it" (Corr. 311). As a result, he ordered sixteen volumes of unpublished writing burnt upon his death because, presumably, he did not feel they were adequate for public consumption. Smith scholars lament this loss because it obfuscates the blueprint of his system, and there have been several attempts of late to reconstruct the design of Smith's corpus, again with the intent of arguing for a particular relationship between his major works.

After holding the chair of logic at Glasgow for only one year (1751–1752), Smith was appointed to the Chair of Moral Philosophy, the position originally held by Hutcheson. He wrote The Theory of Moral Sentiments, first published in 1759, while holding this position and, presumably, while testing out many of his discussions in the classroom. While he spoke very warmly of this period of his life, and while he took a deep interest in teaching and mentoring young minds, Smith resigned in 1764 to tutor the Duke of Buccleuch and accompany him on his travels.

It was not uncommon for professional teachers to accept positions as private tutors. The salary and pensions were often lucrative, and it allowed more flexibility than a busy lecturing schedule might afford. In Smith's case, this position took him to France where he spent two years engaged with the philosophes—a tight-knit group of French philosophers analogous to Smith's own literati—in conversations that would make their way into The Wealth of Nations. How influential the philosophes were in the creation of Smith's political economy is a matter of controversy. Some scholars suggest that Smith's attitudes were formed as a result of their persuasion while others suggest that Smith's ideas were solidified much earlier than his trip abroad. Whatever the case, this shows that Smith's interests were aligned, not just with the Scottish philosophers, but with their European counterparts. Smith's writing was well-received in part because it was so timely. He was asking the deep questions of the time; his answers would change the world.

After his travels, Smith returned to his home town of Kirkcaldy to complete The Wealth of Nations. It was first published in 1776 and was praised both by his friends and the general public. In a letter written much later, he referred to it as the "very violent attack I had made upon the whole commercial system of Great Britain" (Corr. 208). The Theory of Moral Sentiments went through six editions in Smith's lifetime, two of which contained major substantive changes and The Wealth of Nations saw four different editions with more minor alterations. Smith indicated that he thought The Theory of Moral Sentiments was a better book, and his on-going attention to its details and adjustments to its theory bear out, at least, that he was more committed to refining it. Eventually, Smith moved to Edinburgh with his mother and was appointed commissioner of customs in 1778; he did not publish anything substantive for the remainder of his life. Adam Smith died on July 17, 1790.

After his death, The Wealth of Nations continued to grow in stature and The Theory of Moral Sentiments began to fade into the background. In the more than two centuries since his death, his published work has been supplemented by the discoveries of his early writing fragments, the student-authored lectures notes on his course in rhetoric and belles-letters, student-authored lecture notes on jurisprudence, and an early draft of part of The Wealth of Nations, the date of which is estimated to be about 1763. The latter two discoveries help shed light on the formulation of his most famous work and supply fodder for both sides of the debate regarding the influence of the philosophes on Smith's political economy.

As stated above, Smith is sometimes credited with being one of the progenitors of modern sociology, and his lectures on rhetoric have also been called the blueprint for the invention of the modern discipline of English; this largely has to do with their influence on his student Hugh Blair, whose own lectures on rhetoric were instrumental in the formation of that discipline. The Theory of Moral Sentiments played an important role in 19th century sentimentalist literature and was also cited by Mary Wollstonecraft to bolster her argument in A Vindication of the Rights of Women: Smith's moral theories experienced a revival in the last quarter of the twentieth century. Secondary sources on Smith flooded the marketplace and interest in Smith's work as a whole has reached an entirely new audience.

There are two noteworthy characteristics of the latest wave of interest in Smith. The first is that scholars are interested in how The Theory of Moral Sentiments and The Wealth of Nations interconnect, not simply in his moral and economic theories as distinct from one another. The second is that it is philosophers and not economists who are primarily interested in Smith's writings. They therefore pay special attention to where Smith might fit in within the already established philosophical canon: How does Smith's work build on Hume's? How does it relate to that of his contemporary Immanuel Kant? (It is known that Kant read The Theory of Moral Sentiments, for example.) To what extent is a sentiment-based moral theory defensible? And, what can one learn about the Scots and eighteenth-century philosophy in general from reading Smith in a historical context? These are but a few of the questions with which Smith's readers now concern themselves.

2. The Theory of Moral Sentiments

a. Sympathy

Hutcheson, Hume, and Smith were unified by their opposition to arguments put forth by Bernard Mandeville. A Dutch-born philosopher who relocated to England, Mandeville argued that benevolence does no social good whatsoever. His book, The Fable of the Bees: Private Vices, Public Benefits, tells the whole story. Bad behavior has positive social impact. Without vice, we would have, for example, no police, locksmiths, or other such professionals. Without indulgence, there would be only minimal consumer spending. Virtue, on the other hand, he argued, has no positive economic benefit and is therefore not to be encouraged.

But Mandeville took this a step further, arguing, as did Thomas Hobbes, that moral virtue derives from personal benefit, that humans are essentially selfish, and that all people are in competition with one another. Hobbes was a moral relativist, arguing that "good" is just a synonym for "that which people desire." Mandeville's relativism, if it can be called that, is less extreme. While he argues that virtue is the intentional act for the good of others with the objective of achieving that good, he casts doubt on whether or not anyone could actually achieve this standard. Smith seems to treat both philosophers as if they argue for the same conclusion; both offer counterpoints to Shaftesbury's approach. Tellingly, Mandeville writes wistfully of Shaftesbury's positive accounts of human motivation, remarking they are "a high Compliment to Human-kind," adding, however, "what Pity it is that they are not true" (Fable, I, 324).

Smith was so opposed to Hobbes's and Mandeville's positions that the very first sentence of The Theory of Moral Sentiments begins with their rejection:

However selfish man may be supposed, there are evidently some principles in his nature, which interest him in the fortune of others, and render their happiness necessary to him, though they derive nothing from it except the pleasure of seeing it. (TMS I.i.1.1)

While it is often assumed that people are selfish, Smith argues that experience suggests otherwise. People derive pleasure from seeing the happiness of others because, by design, others concern us. With this initial comment, Smith outlines the central themes of his moral philosophy: human beings are social, we care about others and their circumstances bring us pleasure or pain. It is only through our senses, through "seeing," that we acquire knowledge of their sentiments. Smith's first sentence associates egoism with supposition or presumption, but scientific "principles" of human activity are associated with evidence: Newtonianism and empiricism in action.

The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS) is a beautifully written book, clear and engaging. With few exceptions, the sentences are easy to follow, and it is written in a lively manner that speaks of its rehearsal in the classroom. Smith has a particular flair for examples, both literary and from day-to-day life, and his use of "we" throughout brings the reader into direct dialogue with Smith. The book feels like an accurate description of human emotions and experience—there are times when it feels phenomenological, although Smith would not have understood this word. He uses repetition to great benefit, reminding his readers of the central points in his theories while he slowly builds their complexity. At only 342 pages (all references are to the Glasgow Editions of his work), the book encompasses a tremendous range of themes. Disguised as a work of moral psychology—as a theory of moral sentiments alone—it is also a book about social organization, identity construction, normative standards, and the science of human behavior as a whole.

Smith tells us that the two questions of moral philosophy are "Wherein does virtue consist?" and "By what power or faculty in the mind is it, that this character, whatever it be, is recommended to us?" (TMS VII.i.2) In other words, we are to ask what goodness is and how we are to be good. The Theory of Moral Sentiments follows this plan, although Smith tackles the second question first, focusing on moral psychology long before he addresses the normative question of moral standards. For Smith, the core of moral learning and deliberation—the key to the development of identity itself—is social unity, and social unity is enabled through sympathy.

The term "sympathy" is Hume's, but Smith's friend gives little indication as to how it was supposed to work or as to its limits. In contrast, Smith addresses the problem head on, devoting the first sixty-six pages of TMS to illuminating its workings and most of the next two hundred elaborating on its nuances. The last part of the book (part VII, "Of Systems of Moral Philosophy") is the most distanced from this topic, addressing the history of ethics but, again, only for slightly less than sixty pages. It is noteworthy that while modern writers almost always place the "literature review" in the beginning of their books, Smith feels that a historical discussion of ethics is only possible after the work on moral psychology is complete. This is likely because Smith wanted to establish the principles of human behavior first so that he could evaluate moral theory in the light of what had been posited.

The Theory of Moral Sentiments is, not surprisingly, both Aristotelian and Newtonian. It is also Stoic in its account of nature and self-command. The first sentence quoted above is a first principle—individuals are not egoistic—and all the rest of the book follows from this assertion. And, as with all first principles, while Smith "assumes" the possibility of other-oriented behavior, the rest of the book both derives from its truth and contributes to its believability. Smith's examples, anecdotes, and hypotheticals are all quite believable, and if one is to accept these as accurate depictions of the human experience, then one must also accept his starting point. Human beings care for others, and altruism, or beneficence as he calls it, is possible.

What is sympathy, then? This is a matter of controversy. Scholars have regarded it as a faculty, a power, a process, and a feeling. What it is not, however, is a moral sense in the most literal meaning of the term. Sympathy is not a sixth capacity that can be grouped with the five senses. Smith, while influenced by Hutcheson, is openly critical of his teacher. He argues that moral sense without judgment is impossible (TMS VII.3.3.8-9), and sympathy is that which allows us to make judgments about ourselves and others. Sympathy is the foundation for moral deliberation, Smith argues, and Hutcheson's system has no room for it.

For Smith, sympathy is more akin to modern empathy, the ability to relate to someone else's emotions because we have experienced similar feelings. While contemporary "sympathy" refers only to feeling bad for a person's suffering, Smith uses it to denote "fellow-feeling with any passion whatever" (TMS I.i.1.5). It is how a "spectator... changes places in fancy with... the person principally concerned" (TMS I.i.1.3-5).

In short, sympathy works as follows: individuals witness the actions and reactions of others. When doing so, this spectator attempts to enter into the situation he or she observes and imagines what it is like to be the actor—the person being watched. (Smith uses actor and agent interchangeably.) Then, the spectator imagines what he or she would do as the actor. If the sentiments match up, if the imagined reaction is analogous to the observed reaction, then the spectator sympathizes with the original person. If the reactions are significantly different, then the spectator does not sympathize with the person. In this context, then, sympathy is a form of moral approval and lack of sympathy indicates disapproval.

Sympathy is rarely exact. Smith is explicit that the imagined sentiments are always less intense than the original, but they are nonetheless close enough to signify agreement. And, most important, mutual sympathy is pleasurable. By nature's design, people want to share fellow-feeling with one another and will therefore temper their actions so as to find common ground. This is further indication of the social nature of human beings; for Smith, isolation and moral disagreement is to be avoided. It is also the mechanism that moderates behavior. Behavior modulation is how individuals learn to act with moral propriety and within social norms. According to The Theory of Moral Sentiments, mutual sympathy is the foundation for reward and punishment.

Smith is insistent, though, that sympathy is not inspired by simply witnessing the emotions of others even though it "may seem to be transfused from one man to another, instantaneously, and antecedent to any knowledge of what excited them in the person principally concerned" (TMS I.i.1.6). Rather, the spectator gathers information about the cause of the emotions and about the person being watched. Only then does he or she ask, given the particular situation and the facts of this particular agent's life, whether the sentiments are appropriate. As Smith writes:

When I condole with you for the loss of your only son, in order to enter into your grief I do not consider what I, a person of such a character and profession, should suffer, if I had a son, and if that son was unfortunately to die: but I consider what I should suffer if I was really you, and I not only change circumstance with you, but I change persons and characters. My grief, therefore, is entirely upon your own account, and not in the least upon my own. (TMS VI.iii.I.4)

We can see here why the imagination is so important to Smith. Only through this faculty can a person enter into the perspective of another, and only through careful observation and consideration can someone learn all the necessary information relevant to judge moral action. We can also see why sympathy is, for Smith, not an egoistic faculty:

In order to produce this concord, as nature teaches the spectators to assume the circumstances of the person principally concerned, so she teaches this last in some measure to assume those of the spectators. As they are continually placing themselves in his situation, and thence conceiving emotions similar to what he feels; so he is as constantly placing himself in theirs, and thence conceiving some degree of that coolness about his own fortune, with which he is sensible that they will view it. As they are constantly considering what they themselves would feel, if they actually were the sufferers, so he is as constantly led to imagine in what manner he would be affected if he was only one of the spectators of his own situation. As their sympathy makes them look at it, in some measure, with his eyes, so his sympathy makes him look at it, in some measure, with theirs, especially when in their presence and acting under their observation: and as the reflected passion, which he thus conceives, is much weaker than the original one, it necessarily abates the violence of what he felt before he came into their presence, before he began to recollect in what manner they would be affected by it, and to view his situation in this candid and impartial light. (TMS I.i.4.8)

Contrary to the description put forth by the Adam Smith Problem, sympathy cannot be either altruistic or egoistic because the agents are too intertwined. One is constantly making the leap from one point of view to another, and happiness and pleasure are dependant on joint perspectives. Individuals are only moral, and they only find their own happiness, from a shared standpoint. Egoism and altruism melt together for Smith to become a more nuanced and more social type of motivation that incorporates both self-interest and concern for others at the same time.

Typical of Smith, the lengthy paragraph cited above leads to at least two further qualifications. The first is that, as Smith puts it, "we expect less sympathy from a common acquaintance than from a friend... we expect still less sympathy from an assembly of strangers" (TMS I.1.4.10). Because sympathy requires information about events and people, the more distance we have from those around us, the more difficult it is for us to sympathize with their more passionate emotions (and vice versa). Thus, Smith argues, we are to be "more tranquil" in front of acquaintances and strangers; it is unseemly to be openly emotional around those who don't know us. This will lead, eventually, to Smith's discussion of duty in part III—his account of why we act morally towards those with whom we have no connection whatsoever.

The second qualification is more complex and revolves around the last phrase in the paragraph: that one must observe actions in a "candid and impartial light." If movement toward social norms were the only component to sympathy, Smith's theory would be a recipe for homogeneity alone. All sentiments would be modulated to an identical pitch and society would thereafter condemn only difference. Smith recognizes, therefore, that there must be instances in which individuals reject community judgment. They do so via the creation of an imagined impartial spectator.

b. The Impartial Spectator

Using the imagination, individuals who wish to judge their own actions create not just analogous emotions but an entire imaginary person who acts as observer and judge:

When I endeavour to examine my own conduct, when I endeavour to pass sentence upon it, and either to approve or condemn it, it is evident that, in all such cases, I divide myself, as it were, into two persons; and that I, the examiner and judge, represent a different character from that other I, the person whose conduct is examined into and judged of. The first is the spectator, whose sentiments with regard to my own conduct I endeavour to enter into, by placing myself in his situation, and by considering how it would appear to me, when seen from that particular point of view. The second is the agent, the person whom I properly call myself, and of whose conduct, under the character of a spectator, I was endeavouring to form some opinion. The first is the judge; the second the person judged of. But that the judge should, in every respect, be the same with the person judged of, is as impossible, as that the cause should, in every respect, be the same with the effect. (TMS III.1.6)

The impartial spectator is the anthropomorphization of the calm and disinterested self that can be recovered with self control and self reflection. In today's world, someone might advise us to "take a deep breath and step back" from a given situation in order to reflect on our actions more dispassionately. Smith is suggesting the same, although he is describing it in more detail and in conjunction with the larger ethical theory that helps us find conclusions once we do so. Individuals who wish to judge their own actions imaginatively split themselves into two different people and use this bifurcation as a substitute for community observation.

Here we see the legacy of Shaftesbury's soliloquy. An actor who wishes to gauge his or her own behavior has to divide him or herself in the way that Shaftesbury describes, in the way that Hamlet becomes both poet and philosopher. We are passionate about our own actions, and self-deception, according to Smith, is "the source of half the disorders of human life" (TMS III.4.6). Self-division gives individuals the ability to see themselves candidly and impartially and leads us to better self-knowledge. We strive to see ourselves the way others see us, but we do so while retaining access to the privileged personal information that others might not have. The community helps us see past our own biases, but when the community is limited by its own institutionalized bias or simply by lack of information, the impartial spectator can override this and allow an agent to find propriety in the face of a deformed moral system. In the contemporary world, racism and sexism are examples of insidious biases that prevent the community from "seeing" pain and injustice. Smith too can be read as recognizing these prejudices, although he would not have recognized either the terms or the complicated discourses about them that have evolved since he wrote two and a half centuries ago. For example, he cites slavery as an instance of the injustice and ignorance of a community. He writes:

There is not a Negro from the coast of Africa who does not, in this respect, possess a degree of magnanimity which the soul of his sordid master is too often scarce capable of conceiving. Fortune never exerted more cruelly her empire over mankind, than when she subjected those nations of heroes to the refuse of the jails of Europe, to wretches who possess the virtues neither of the countries which they come from, nor of those which they go to, and whose levity, brutality, and baseness, so justly expose them to the contempt of the vanquished. (TMS V.2.9)

Despite its corrective potential, impartiality has its limits. Smith does not imagine the impartial spectator to see from an Archimedean or God's eye point of view. Because the impartial spectator does not really exist—because it is created by an individual person's imagination—it is always subject to the limits of a person's knowledge. This means that judgment will always be imperfect and those moral mistakes that are so profoundly interwoven into society or a person's experience are the hardest to overcome. Change is slow and society is far from perfect. "Custom," as he calls it, interferes with social judgment on both the collective and the individual level. There are two points, according to Smith, when we judge our own actions, before and after we act. As he writes, "Our views are apt to be very partial in both cases; but they are apt to be most partial when it is of most importance that they should be otherwise" (TMS 111.4.2). Neither of these points is independent of social influence.

Knowledge is imperfect and individuals do the best they can. But all individuals are limited both by their own experiences and the natural inadequacies of the human mind. Smith's suggestion, then, is to have faith in the unfolding of nature, and in the principles that govern human activity—moral, social, economic, or otherwise. With this in mind, however, he cautions people against choosing the beauty of systems over the interest of people. Abstract philosophies and abstruse religions are not to take precedent over the evidence provided by experience, Smith argues. Additionally, social engineering is doomed to fail. Smith argues that one cannot move people around the way one moves pieces on a chess board. Each person has his or her "own principle of motion... different from that which the legislature might choose to impress upon" them (TMS VI.ii.2.18).

Smith's caution against the love of systems is a component of Smith's argument for limited government: "Harmony of minds," Smith argues, is not possible without "free communication of settlements and opinion," or, as we would call it today, freedom of expression (TMS VII.iv.27). It also offers a direct connection to Smith's most famous phrase "the invisible hand." In The Theory of Moral Sentiments, he uses the invisible hand to describe the conditions that allow for economic justice. This natural aesthetic love of systems leads people to manipulate the system of commerce, but this interferes with nature's plan:

The rich only select from the heap what is most precious and agreeable. They consume little more than the poor, and in spite of their natural selfishness and rapacity, though they mean only their own conveniency, though the sole end which they propose from the labours of all the thousands whom they employ, be the gratification of their own vain and insatiable desires, they divide with the poor the produce of all their improvements. They are led by an invisible hand to make nearly the same distribution of the necessaries of life, which would have been made, had the earth been divided into equal portions among all its inhabitants, and thus without intending it, without knowing it, advance the interest of the society, and afford means to the multiplication of the species. (TMS IV.1.10)

In this passage, Smith argues that "the capacity of [the rich person's] stomach bars no proportion to the immensity of his desires, and will receive no more than that of the meanest peasant" (TMS IV.1.10). Thus, because the rich only select "the best" and because they can only consume so much, there ought to be enough resources for everyone in the world, as if an invisible hand has divided the earth equally amongst all its inhabitants.

As an economic argument, this might have been more convincing in Smith's time, before refrigeration, the industrial revolution, modern banking practices, and mass accumulation of capital; for a more thorough defense (from Smith's point of view) see the discussion of The Wealth of Nations. However, its relevance to the history of economics is based upon his recognition of the role of unintended consequences, the presumption that economic growth helps all members of the society, and the recognition of the independence of the free market as a natural force. At present, we can focus on Smith's warnings about the power of aesthetic attraction. The Newtonian approach, Smith argues—the search for a coherent narrative without gaps that addresses surprise, wonder, and admiration—can lead people astray if they prioritize beauty over the evidence. This love of the beautiful can also deform moral judgments because it causes the masses to over-value the rich, to think the wealthy are happy with their "baubles and trinkets," and thus to pursue extreme wealth at the cost of moral goodness: "To attain to this envied situation, the candidates for fortune too frequently abandon the paths of virtue; for unhappily, the road which leads to the one and that which leads to the other, lie sometimes in very opposite directions" (TMS I.iii.8). Smith is very critical not only of the rich, but of the moral value society places on them. Only their wealth makes them different, and this love of wealth, and of beauty in general, can distort moral judgment and deform the impartial spectator.

The impartial spectator is a theory of conscience. It provides individuals with the opportunity to assent to their own standards of judgment, which, hopefully, are in general agreement with the standards of the society that houses them. Difference, as Smith discusses in both of his books, is the product of education, economic class, gender, what we would now call ethnic background, individual experience, and natural abilities; but Smith argues that the last of these, natural abilities, constitute the least of the factors. In his Lectures on Jurisprudence, for example, he argues that there is no "original difference" between individuals (LJ(A) vi.47-48), and in The Wealth of Nations, he writes that "The difference of natural talents in different men is, in reality, much less than we are aware of.... The difference between the most dissimilar characters, between a philosopher and a street porter, for example, seems to arise not so much from nature, as from habit, custom and education" (WN I.ii.4). Society and education, hopefully, help to bridge these gaps, and help to cultivate a unified community where people are encouraged to sympathize with others.

Here is the overlap in Smith's two operative questions. First, one encounters his account of moral psychology. (How does one come to know virtue?) Now one comes face to face with the identification of moral standards themselves. (Of what does virtue consist?) Smith may look like a relativist at times: individuals modulate their sentiments to their community standards, and agreement of individual imaginations may falsely seem to be the final arbiter of what is morally appropriate behavior. With this in mind, there are certainly readers who will argue that Smith, despite his rejection of Hobbes and Mandeville, ends up offering no universally binding moral principles. This, however, forgets Smith's Newtonian approach: observation leads to the discovery of natural principles that can be repeatedly tested and verified. Furthermore, many scholars argue that Smith was strongly influenced by the classical Stoics. In addition to inheriting their concern with the modulation of emotions and the repression of emotions in public, he also likely thought that moral laws are written into nature's design in just the same way that Newton's laws of motion are. As a result, some Smith scholars (but certainly not all) argue that Smith is a moral realist, that sympathy is a method of discovery rather than invention, and that what is to be discovered is correct independent of the opinions of those who either know or are ignorant of the rules.

Consistent with this interpretation, Smith emphasizes what he terms the general rules of morality:

...they are ultimately founded upon experience of what, in particular instances, our moral faculties, our natural sense of merit and propriety, approve, or disapprove of. We do not originally approve or condemn particular actions; because, upon examination, they appear to be agreeable or inconsistent with a certain general rule. The general rule, on the contrary, is formed, by finding from experience, that all actions of a certain kind, or circumstanced in a certain manner, are approved or disapproved of. To the man who first saw an inhuman murder, committed from avarice, envy, or unjust resentment, and upon one too that loved and trusted the murderer, who beheld the last agonies of the dying person, who heard him, with his expiring breath, complain more of the perfidy and ingratitude of his false friend, than of the violence which had been done to him, there could be no occasion, in order to conceive how horrible such an action was, that he should reflect, that one of the most sacred rules of conduct was what prohibited the taking away the life of an innocent person, that this was a plain violation of that rule, and consequently a very blamable action. His detestation of this crime, it is evident, would arise instantaneously and antecedent to his having formed to himself any such general rule. The general rule, on the contrary, which he might afterwards form, would be founded upon the detestation which he felt necessarily arise in his own breast, at the thought of this, and every other particular action of the same kind. (TMS III.4.8)

According to Smith, our sentiments give rise to approval or condemnation of a moral act. These can be modified over time with additional information. Eventually, though, spectators, see patterns in the condemnation. They see, for example, that murder is always wrong, and therefore derive a sense that this is a general rule. They begin, then, to act on the principle rather than on the sentiment. They do not murder, not simply because they detest murder, but because murder is wrong in itself. This, again, is Aristotelian in that it recognizes the interaction between intellectual and moral virtue. It also shares commonalities with the Kantian deontology that became so influential several decades after the publication of TMS. Like Kant, Smith's agents begin to act on principle rather than emotion. Unlike Kant, however, reason in itself does not justify or validate the principle, experience does.

Smith does several things in the last excerpt. First, he embraces the Newtonian process of scientific experimentation and explanation. Moral rules are akin to the laws of physics; they can be discovered. Second, Smith anticipates Karl Popper's twentieth-century claim that scientific truths are established through a process of falsification: we cannot prove what is true, Popper argued. Instead, we discover what is false and rule it out.

c. Virtues, Duty, and Justice

Smith emphasizes a number of virtues along with duty and justice. Self-command, he argues "is not only itself a great virtue, but from it all the other virtues seem to derive their principle lustre" (TMS VI.iii.11). This should not be surprising since, for Smith, it is only through self-command that agents can modulate their sentiments to the pitch required either by the community or the impartial spectator. Self-command is necessary because "the disposition to anger, hatred, envy, malice, [and] revenge... drive men from one another," while "humanity, kindness, natural affection, friendship, [and] esteem... tend to unite men in society" (TMS VI.iii.15). One can see, then, the normative content of Smith's virtues—those sentiments that are to be cultivated and those that are to be minimized. According to Smith, humans have a natural love for society and can develop neither moral nor aesthetic standards in isolation.

Individuals have a natural desire not only be to be loved, but to be worthy of love: "He desires not only praise, but praiseworthiness,... he dreads not only blame, but blame-worthiness" (TMS III.2.2). This speaks first to the power of the impartial spectator who is a guide to worth when no spectators are around. It also speaks to Smith's conception of duty, in that it sets a standard of right action independent of what communities set forth. Individuals "derive no satisfaction" from unworthy praise (TMS III.2.5), and doing so is an indication of the perversion of vanity than can be corrected by seeing ourselves the way others would, if they knew the whole story.

It should not be surprising that Smith addresses God amidst his discussion of duty:

The all-wise Author of Nature has, in this manner, taught man to respect the sentiments and judgments of his brethren; to be more or less pleased when they approve of his conduct, and to be more or less hurt when they disapprove of it. He has made man, if I may say so, the immediate judge of mankind; and has, in this respect, as in many others, created him after his own image, and appointed him his vicegerent upon earth, to superintend the behaviour of his brethren. They are taught by nature, to acknowledge that power and jurisdiction which has thus been conferred upon him, to be more or less humbled and mortified when they have incurred his censure, and to be more or less elated when they have obtained his applause. (TMS III.2.31)

Here Smith makes several points. First, like many of the Scots, as well as Thomas Jefferson and many of the American founders, Smith was a deist. While there is controversy amongst scholars about the extent to which God is necessary to Smith's theory, it is likely that he believed that God designed the universe and its rules, and then stepped back as it unfolded. Smith's God is not an interventionist God and, despite some readers suggesting the contrary, the invisible hand is not an indication of God's involvement in creation. It is, instead, just the unfolding of sociological and economic principles. Second, because God is detached from the system, Smith argues that human beings are God's regents on earth. It is up to them to be the judges of their own behavior. Individuals are necessarily most concerned with themselves first, and are therefore best self-governed. Only then can they judge others via the moral system Smith describes. While it is true that, as Smith puts it, the general rules are "justly regarded as the laws of the deity" (TMS III.v), this seems to be a point of motivation, not of metaphysical assertion. If individuals understand the general rules as stemming from God, then they will follow them with more certainty and conviction. "The terrors of religion should thus enforce the natural sense of duty" (TMS III.5.7), Smith writes, because it inspires people to follow the general rules even if they are inclined not to do so, and because this support makes religion compatible with social and political life. Religious fanaticism, as Smith points out in The Wealth of Nations, is one of the great causes of factionalism—the great enemy of political society.

For Smith, the most precise virtue is justice. It is "the main pillar that upholds the whole edifice" of society (TMS III.ii.4). It is, as he describes it, "a negative virtue" and the minimal condition for participation in the community. Obeying the rules of justice, therefore, result in little praise, but breaking them inspires great condemnation:

There is, no doubt, a propriety in the practice of justice, and it merits, upon that account, all the approbation which is due to propriety. But as it does no real positive good, it is entitled to very little gratitude. Mere justice is, upon most occasions, but a negative virtue, and only hinders us from hurting our neighbour. The man who barely abstains from violating either the person, or the estate, or the reputation of his neighbours, has surely very little positive merit. He fulfils, however, all the rules of what is peculiarly called justice, and does every thing which his equals can with propriety force him to do, or which they can punish him for not doing. We may often fulfil all the rules of justice by sitting still and doing nothing. (TMS II.ii.1.9)

Smith's account of justice assumes that individual rights and safety are core concerns. He writes:

The most sacred laws of justice, therefore, those whose violation seems to call loudest for vengeance and punishment, are the laws which guard the life and person of our neighbour; the next are those which guard his property and possessions; and last of all come those which guard what are called his personal rights, or what is due to him from the promises of others. (TMS II.ii.2.3)

His discussion of justice is supplemented in The Wealth of Nations and would have likely been added to in his proposed work on "the general principles of law and government" that he never completed. His lectures on jurisprudence give one a hint as to what might have been in that work, but one must assume that the manuscript was part of the collection of works burnt upon his death. (It is not even known what was actually destroyed, let alone what the works argued.) It is frustrating for Smith's readers to have such gaps in his theory, and Smith scholars have debated the possible content of his other work and the way it relates to his first book. It is clear, though, that The Theory of Moral Sentiments is only one part of Smith's larger system, and one truly understands it only in light of his other writing. It is therefore necessary to switch the discussion from his work on moral philosophy to his political economy. As will be evident, this break is not a radical one. The two books are entirely compatible with one another and reading one supplements reading the other; both contain moral claims and both make assertions classified as political economy. While their emphases are different much of the time—they are two different books after all—their basic points are more than just harmonious. They depend upon one another for justification.

3. An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations

a. Wealth and Trade

The Wealth of Nations (WN) was published in March of 1776, four months before the signing of the American Declaration of Independence. It is a much larger book than The Theory of Moral Sentiments—not counting appendices and indices, it runs 947 pages. To the first time reader, therefore, it may seem more daunting than Smith's earlier work, but in many ways, it is actually a simpler read. As he grew older, Smith's writing style became more efficient and less flowery, but his authorial voice remained conversational. His terms are more strictly defined in WN than in TMS, and he clearly identifies those positions he supports and rejects. His economic discussions are not as layered as his comments on morality, so the interpretive issues are often less complex. The logic of the book is transparent: its organizational scheme is self-explanatory, and its conclusions are meticulously supported with both philosophical argument and economic data. There are many who challenge its assertions, of course, but it is hard to deny that Smith's positions in WN are defensible even if, in the end, some may conclude that he is wrong.

The text is divided into five "books" published in one, two, or three bound volumes depending on the edition. The first books outline the importance of the division of labor and of self-interest. The second discusses the role of stock and capital. The third provides an historical account of the rise of wealth from primitive times up until commercial society. The fourth discusses the economic growth that derives from the interaction between urban and rural sectors of a commercial society. The fifth and final book presents the role of the sovereign in a market economy, emphasizing the nature and limits of governmental powers and the means by which political institutions are to be paid for. Smith, along with his Scottish Enlightenment contemporaries, juxtaposes different time periods in order to find normative guidance. As TMS does, The Wealth of Nations contains a philosophy of history that trusts nature to reveal its logic and purpose.

This is a remarkable scope, even for a book of its size. Smith's achievement, however, is not simply the multitude of his discussions, but how he makes it all fit together. His most impressive accomplishment in The Wealth of Nations is the presentation of a system of political economy. Smith makes seemingly disparate elements interdependent and consistent. He manages to take his Newtonian approach and create a narrative of both power and beauty, addressing the philosophical along with the economic, describing human behavior and history, and prescribing the best action for economic and political betterment. And, he does so building on a first principle that was at least as controversial as the sentence that began The Theory of Moral Sentiments. He begins the introduction by asserting:

The annual labour of every nation is the fund which originally supplies it with all the necessaries and conveniencies of life which it annually consumes, and which consist always either in the immediate produce of that labour, or in what is purchased with that produce from other nations. (WN intro.1)

The dominant economic theory of Smith's time was mercantilism. It held that the wealth of a nation was to be assessed by the amount of money and goods within its borders at any given time. Smith calls this "stock." Mercantilists sought to restrict trade because this increased the assets within the borders which, in turn, were thought to increase wealth. Smith opposed this, and the sentence cited above shifted the definition of national wealth to a different standard: labor.

The main point of The Wealth of Nations is to offer an alternative to mercantilism. Labor brings wealth, Smith argues. The more one labors the more one earns. This supplies individuals and the community with their necessities, and, with enough money, it offers the means to make life more convenient and sometimes to pursue additional revenue. Free trade, Smith argues, rather than diminishing the wealth of the nation, increases it because it provides more occasion for labor and therefore more occasion to create more wealth. Limited trade keeps the amount of wealth within the borders relatively constant, but the more trade a country engages in, the wider the market becomes and the more potential there is for additional labor and, in turn, additional wealth. This point leads Smith to divide stock into two parts, that which is used for immediate consumption—the assets that allow a person to acquire necessities—and that which is used to earn additional revenue. This latter sum he calls "capital" (WN II.1.2), and the term "capitalism" (which, again, Smith does not use) is derived from its use in a commercial system: capital is specifically earmarked for reinvestment and is therefore a major economic engine.

This is, of course, a philosophical point as much as an economic one: Smith asks his readers to reconsider the meaning of wealth itself. Is wealth the money and assets that one has at any given time, or is it these things combined with the potential to have more, to adjust to circumstances, and to cultivate the skills to increase such potential? Smith thinks it is the latter. Smith is also concerned specifically with the distinction between necessities and conveniences. His overarching concern in The Wealth of Nations is the creation of "universal opulence which extends itself to the lowest ranks of the people" (WN I.i.10). In other words, Smith believes that a commercial system betters the lives for the worst off in society; all individuals should have the necessities needed to live reasonably well. He is less concerned with "conveniences" and "luxuries;" he does not argue for an economically egalitarian system. Instead, he argues for a commercial system that increases both the general wealth and the particular wealth of the poorest members. He writes:

Is this improvement in the circumstances of the lower ranks of the people to be regarded as an advantage or as an inconveniency to the society? The answer seems at first sight abundantly plain. Servants, labourers and workmen of different kinds, make up the far greater part of every great political society. But what improves the circumstances of the greater part can never be regarded as an inconveniency to the whole. No society can surely be flourishing and happy, of which the far greater part of the members are poor and miserable. It is but equity, besides, that they who feed, cloath and lodge the whole body of the people, should have such a share of the produce of their own labour as to be themselves tolerably well fed, cloathed and lodged. (WN I.viii.36)

Smith argues that the key to the betterment of the masses is an increase in labor, productivity, and workforce. There are two main factors that influence this: "the skill, dexterity, and judgment with which its labour is generally applied," and "the proportion between the number of those who are employed in useful labour, and that of those who are not" (WN intro.3).

Smith repeats the phrase "skill, dexterity and judgment" in the first paragraph of the body of the book, using it to segue into a discussion of manufacture. Famously, he uses the division of labor to illustrate the efficiency of workers working on complementary specific and narrow tasks. Considering the pin-maker, he suggests that a person who was required to make pins by him or herself could hardly make one pin per day, but if the process were divided into a different task for different people—"one man draws out the wire, another straights it, a third cuts it, a fourth points it, a fifth grinds it at the top for receiving the head; to make the head requires two or three distinct operations; to put it on, is a peculiar business, to whiten the pins is another"—then the factory could make approximately forty-eight thousand pins per day (WN I.i.3).

The increase in efficiency is also an increase in skill and dexterity, and brings with it a clarion call for the importance of specialization in the market. The more focused a worker is on a particular task the more likely they are to create innovation. He offers the following example:

In the first fire-engines, a boy was constantly employed to open and shut alternately the communication between the boiler and the cylinder, according as the piston either ascended or descended. One of those boys, who loved to play with his companions, observed that, by tying a string from the handle of the valve which opened this communication, to another part of the machine, the valve would open and shut without his assistance, and leave him at liberty to divert himself with his play-fellows. One of the greatest improvements that has been made upon this machine, since it was first invented, was in this manner the discovery of a boy who wanted to save his own labour. (WN I.i.8)

This example of a boy looking to ease his work day, illustrates two separate points. The first is the discussion at hand, the importance of specialization. In a commercial society, Smith argues, narrow employment becomes the norm: "Each individual becomes more expert in his own peculiar branch, more work is done upon the whole, and the quantity of science is considerably increased by it" (WN I.i.9). However, the more important point—certainly the more revolutionary one—is the role of self-interest in economic life. A free market harnesses personal desires for the betterment not of individuals but of the community.

Echoing but tempering Mandeville's claim about private vices becoming public benefits, Smith illustrates that personal needs are complementary and not mutually exclusive. Human beings, by nature, have a "propensity to truck, barter, and exchange one thing for another" (WN I.ii.1). This tendency, which Smith suggests may be one of the "original principles in human nature," is common to all people and drives commercial society forward. In an oft-cited comment, Smith observes,

It is not from the benevolence of the butcher, the brewer, or the baker, that we expect our dinner, but from their regard to their own self-interest. We address ourselves, not to their humanity but to their self-love, and never talk to them of our own necessities but of their advantages. (WN I.ii.2)

Philosophically, this is a tectonic shift in moral prescription. Dominant Christian beliefs had assumed that any self-interested action was sinful and shameful; the ideal person was entirely focused on the needs of others. Smith's commercial society assumes something different. It accepts that the person who focuses on his or her own needs actually contributes to the public good and that, as a result, such self-interest should be cultivated.

Smith is not a proponent of what would today be called rampant consumerism. He is critical of the rich in both of his books. Instead, his argument is one that modern advocates of globalization and free trade will find familiar: when individuals purchase a product, they help more people than they attempted to do so through charity. He writes:

Observe the accommodation of the most common artificer or day-labourer in a civilized and thriving country, and you will perceive that the number of people of whose industry a part, though but a small part, has been employed in procuring him this accommodation, exceeds all computation. The woollen coat, for example, which covers the day-labourer, as coarse and rough as it may appear, is the produce of the joint labour of a great multitude of workmen. The shepherd, the sorter of the wool, the wool-comber or carder, the dyer, the scribbler, the spinner, the weaver, the fuller, the dresser, with many others, must all join their different arts in order to complete even this homely production. How many merchants and carriers, besides, must have been employed in transporting the materials from some of those workmen to others who often live in a very distant part of the country! how much commerce and navigation in particular, how many ship-builders, sailors, sail-makers, rope-makers, must have been employed in order to bring together the different drugs made use of by the dyer, which often come from the remotest corners of the world! What a variety of labour too is necessary in order to produce the tools of the meanest of those workmen! To say nothing of such complicated machines as the ship of the sailor, the mill of the fuller, or even the loom of the weaver, let us consider only what a variety of labour is requisite in order to form that very simple machine, the shears with which the shepherd clips the wool. The miner, the builder of the furnace for smelting the ore, the feller of the timber, the burner of the charcoal to be made use of in the smelting-house, the brick-maker, the brick-layer, the workmen who attend the furnace, the mill-wright, the forger, the smith, must all of them join their different arts in order to produce them. Were we to examine, in the same manner, all the different parts of his dress and household furniture, the coarse linen shirt which he wears next his skin, the shoes which cover his feet, the bed which he lies on, and all the different parts which compose it, the kitchen-grate at which he prepares his victuals, the coals which he makes use of for that purpose, dug from the bowels of the earth, and brought to him perhaps by a long sea and a long land carriage, all the other utensils of his kitchen, all the furniture of his table, the knives and forks, the earthen or pewter plates upon which he serves up and divides his victuals, the different hands employed in preparing his bread and his beer, the glass window which lets in the heat and the light, and keeps out the wind and the rain, with all the knowledge and art requisite for preparing that beautiful and happy invention, without which these northern parts of the world could scarce have afforded a very comfortable habitation, together with the tools of all the different workmen employed in producing those different conveniencies; if we examine, I say, all these things, and consider what a variety of labour is employed about each of them, we shall be sensible that without the assistance and co-operation of many thousands, the very meanest person in a civilized country could not be provided, even according to what we very falsely imagine, the easy and simple manner in which he is commonly accommodated. Compared, indeed, with the more extravagant luxury of the great, his accommodation must no doubt appear extremely simple and easy; and yet it may be true, perhaps, that the accommodation of an European prince does not always so much exceed that of an industrious and frugal peasant, as the accommodation of the latter exceeds that of many an African king, the absolute master of the lives and liberties of ten thousand naked savages. (WN I.i.11)

The length of this excerpt is part of its argumentative power. Smith is not suggesting, simply, that a single purchase benefits a group of people. Instead, he is arguing that once you take seriously the multitude of people whose income is connected to the purchase of the single coat, it is hard to even grasp the numbers we are considering. A single purchase brings with it a vast network of laborers. Furthermore, he argues, while one may be critical of the inevitable class difference of a commercial society, the differential is almost inconsequential compared to the disparity between the "haves" and "have-nots" in a feudal or even the most primitive societies. (Smith's reference to "a thousand naked savages" is just thoughtless eighteenth century racism and can be chalked-up to the rhetoric of the time. It ought to be disregarded and has no impact on the argument itself.) It is the effect of one minor purchase on the community of economic agents that allows Smith to claim, as he does in TMS, that the goods of the world are divided equally as if by an invisible hand. For Smith, the wealthy can purchase nothing without benefiting the poor.

According to The Wealth of Nations, the power of the woolen coat is the power of the market at work, and its reach extends to national economic policy as well as personal economic behavior. Smith's comments relate to his condemnation of social engineering in The Theory of Moral Sentiments, and he uses the same metaphor—the invisible hand—to condemn those mercantilists who think that by manipulating the market, they can improve the lot of individual groups of people.

But the annual revenue of every society is always precisely equal to the exchangeable value of the whole annual produce of its industry, or rather is precisely the same thing with that exchangeable value. As every individual, therefore, endeavours as much as he can both to employ his capital in the support of domestic industry, and so to direct that industry that its produce may be of the greatest value; every individual necessarily labours to render the annual revenue of the society as great as he can. He generally, indeed, neither intends to promote the public interest, nor knows how much he is promoting it. By preferring the support of domestic to that of foreign industry, he intends only his own security; and by directing that industry in such a manner as its produce may be of the greatest value, he intends only his own gain, and he is in this, as in many other cases, led by an invisible hand to promote an end which was no part of his intention. Nor is it always the worse for the society that it was no part of it. By pursuing his own interest he frequently promotes that of the society more effectually than when he really intends to promote it. I have never known much good done by those who affected to trade for the public good. It is an affectation, indeed, not very common among merchants, and very few words need be employed in dissuading them from it. (WN IV.2.9)

Smith begins his comments here with a restatement of the main point of The Wealth of Nations: "...the annual revenue of every society is always precisely equal to the exchangeable value of the whole annual produce of its industry, or rather is precisely the same thing with that exchangeable value." The income of any community is its labor. Smith's remarks about the invisible hand suggest that one can do more damage by trying to manipulate the system than by trusting it to work. This is the moral power of unintended consequences, as TMS's account of the invisible hand makes clear as well.

What Smith relies upon here is not "moral luck" as Bernard Williams will later call it, but, rather, that nature is logical because it operates on principles, and, therefore, certain outcomes can be predicted. Smith recognizes that human beings and their interactions are part of nature and not to be understood separately from it. As in The Theory of Moral Sentiments, social and political behavior follows a natural logic. Now Smith makes the same claim for economic acts. Human society is as natural as the people in it, and, as such, Smith rejects the notion of a social contract in both of his books. There was never a time that humanity lived outside of society, and political development is the product of evolution (not his term) rather than a radical shift in organization. The state of nature is society for Smith and the Scots, and, therefore, the rules that govern the system necessitate certain outcomes.

b. History and Labor

Smith's account of history describes human civilization as moving through four different stages, time periods that contain nations of hunters, nations of shepherds, agricultural nations, and, finally commercial societies (WN V.i.a, see, also, LJ(A) i.27; see also LJ(B) 25, 27, 149, 233). This is progress, Smith insists, and each form of society is superior to the previous one. It is also natural. This is how the system is designed to operate; history has a logic to it. Obviously, this account, in fact all of The Wealth of Nations, was very influential for Karl Marx. It marks the important beginning of what would be called social science—Smith's successor to the Chair of Moral Philosophy, Adam Ferguson, is often identified as the founder of modern sociology—and is representative of the project the Scottish Enlightenment thinkers referred to as "the science of man."

Smith's discussion of history illustrates two other important points. First, he argues that the primary economic tension, and, as a result, the primary economic engine, in any given society can be found in the interaction between "the inhabitants of the town and those of the country" (WN III.i.1). According to Smith, agricultural lands supply the means of sustenance for any given society and urban populations provide the means of manufacture. Urban areas refine and advance the means of production and return some of its produce to rural people. In each of the stages, the town and country have a different relationship with each other, but they always interact.

Here, Smith is indebted to the physiocrats, French economists who believed that agricultural labor was the primary measure of national wealth. Smith accepted their notion that productive labor was a component of the wealth of nations but rejected their notion that only agricultural labor should be counted as value. He argues, instead, that if one group had to be regarded as more important, it would be the country since it provides food for the masses, but that it would be a mistake to regard one's gain as the other's loss or that their relationship is essentially hierarchical: "the gains of both are mutual and reciprocal, and the division of labour is in this, as in all other cases, advantageous to all the different persons employed in the various occupations into which it is subdivided" (WN III.i.1).

Again, there are philosophical issues here. First, is what one is to regard as labor; second is what counts towards economic value. Additionally, Smith is showing how the division of labor works on a large scale; it is not just for pin factories. Rather, different populations can be dedicated to different tasks for everyone's benefit. (This might be an anticipation of David Ricardo's notion of "comparative advantage.") A commercial system is an integrated one and the invisible hand ensures that what benefits one group can also benefit another. Again, the butcher, brewer, and baker gain their livelihood by manufacturing the lunch of their customers.

Returning to Smith's account of history, Smith also argues that historical moments and their economic arrangements help determine the form of government. As the economic stage changes, so does the form of government. Economics and politics are intertwined, Smith observes, and a feudal system could not have a republican government as is found in commercial societies. What Smith does here, again, is anticipate Marx's dialectical materialism, showing how history influences economic and political options, but, of course, he does not take it nearly as far as the German does close to a century later.

Given the diversity of human experience—WN's stage theory of history helps account for difference—Smith is motivated to seek unifying standards that can help translate economic value between circumstances. Two examples are his discussions of price and his paradox of value. Within these discussions, Smith seeks an adequate measure of "worth" for goods and services. Consumers look at prices to gauge value, but there are good and bad amounts; which is which is not always transparent. Some items are marked too expensive for their actual value and some are a bargain. In developing a system to account for this interaction, Smith offers a range of different types of prices, but the two most important are natural price—the price that covers all the necessary costs of manufacture—and the market price, what a commodity actually goes for on the market. When the market and the natural prices are identical, the market is functioning well: "the natural price, therefore, is, as it were, the central price to which the prices of all commodities are continually gravitating" (WN I.vii.15).

Here, the term "gravitating" indicates, yet again, that there are principles that guide the economic system, and a properly functioning marketplace—one in which individuals are in "perfect liberty"—will have the natural and market prices coincide (WN i.vii.30). (Smith defines perfect liberty as a condition under which a person "may change his trade as often as he pleases" (WN I.vii.6)). Whether this is a normative value, whether for Smith the natural price is better than other prices, and whether the market price of a commodity should be in alignment with the natural price, is a matter of debate.

Following the question of worth, Smith poses the paradox of value. He explains: "Nothing is more useful than water: but it will purchase scarce any thing; scarce anything can be had in exchange for it. A diamond, on the contrary, has scarce any value in use; but a very great quantity of other goods may frequently be had in exchange for it" (WN I.iv.13). Smith's question is straightforward: why is water so much cheaper than diamonds when it is so much more important for everyday life?

Obviously, we are tempted to argue that scarcity plays a role in the solution to this paradox; water is more valuable than diamonds to a person dying of thirst. For Smith, however, value, here, is general utility and it seems problematic to Smith that the more useful commodity has the lower market price. His solution, then, is to distinguish between two types of value, "value in use" and "value in exchange"—the former is the commodity's utility and the latter is what it can be exchanged for in the market. Dividing the two analytically allows consumers to evaluate the goods both in terms of scarcity and in terms of usefulness. However, Smith is also searching for a normative or objective core in a fluctuating and contextual system, as with the role of impartiality in his moral system. Scarcity would not solve this problem because that, too, is fluctuating; usefulness is largely subjective and depends on an individual's priorities and circumstance. Smith seeks a more universal criterion and looks towards labor to anchor his notion of value: "labour," he writes, "is the real measure of the exchangeable value of all commodities" (WN I.v).

What Smith means by this is unclear and a matter of controversy. What seems likely, though, is that one person's labor in any given society is not significantly different from another person's. Human capabilities do not change radically from one time period or location to another, and their labor, therefore, can be compared: "the difference of natural talents in different men is, in reality, much less than we are aware of." He elaborates:

Labour, therefore, it appears evidently, is the only universal, as well as the only accurate measure of value, or the only standard by which we can compare the values of different commodities at all times and at all places. We cannot estimate, it is allowed, the real value of different commodities from century to century by the quantities of silver which were given for them. We cannot estimate it from year to year by the quantities of corn. By the quantities of labour we can, with the greatest accuracy, estimate it both from century to century and from year to year. From century to century, corn is a better measure than silver, because, from century to century, equal quantities of corn will command the same quantity of labour more nearly than equal quantities of silver. From year to year, on the contrary, silver is a better measure than corn, because equal quantities of it will more nearly command the same quantity of labour. (WN I.v.17)

In other words, for example, a lone person can only lift so much wheat at one go, and while some people are stronger than others, the differences between them don't make that much difference. Therefore, Smith seems to believe, the value of any object can be universally measured by the amount of labor that any person in any society might have to exert in order to acquire that object. While this is not necessarily a satisfying standard to all—many economists argue that the labor theory of value has been surpassed—it does, again, root Smith's objectivity in impartiality. The "any person" quality of the impartial spectator is analogous to the "any laborer" standard Smith seems to use as a value measure.

Ultimately, according to Smith, a properly functioning market is one in which all these conditions—price, value, progress, efficiency, specialization, and universal opulence (wealth)—all work together to provide economic agents with a means to exchange accurately and freely as their self-interest motivates them. None of these conditions can be met if the government does not act appropriately, or if it oversteps its justified boundaries.

c. Political Economy

The Wealth of Nations is a work of political economy. It is concerned with much more than the mechanisms of exchange. It is also concerned with the ideal form of government for commercial advancement and the pursuit of self-interest. This is where Smith's reputation as a laissez faire theorist comes in. He is arguing for a system, as he calls it, of "natural liberty," one in which the market largely governs itself as is free from excessive state intervention (recall Smith's use of the invisible hand in TMS). As he explains, there are only three proper roles for the sovereign: to protect a society from invasion by outside forces, to enforce justice and protect citizens from one another, and "thirdly, the duty of erecting and maintaining certain publick works and certain publick institutions, which it can never be for the interest of any individual, or small number of individuals, to erect and maintain; because the profit could never repay the expence to any individual or small number of individuals, though it may frequently do much more than repay it to a great society" (WN IV.ix).

Each of the responsibilities of the sovereign contains its own controversies. Regarding the first, protecting society, Smith debated with others as to whether a citizen militia or a standing army was better suited for the job, rooting his discussion, as usual, in a detailed history of the military in different stages of society (WN V.1.a). Given the nature of specialization, it should not be surprising that Smith favored the army (WN V.1.a.28). The nature of justice—the second role of the sovereign—is also complicated, and Smith never fully articulated his theory of what justice is and how it ought to be maintained, although, as we have seen, he was liberal in his assumptions of the rights of individuals against the imposition of government on matters of conscience and debate. In his chapter on "the expence of justice" (WN V.i.b), he discusses the nature of human subordination and why human beings like to impose themselves on one another. However, it is the third role of the sovereign—the maintenance of works that are too expensive for individuals to erect and maintain, or what are called "natural monopolies"—that is the most controversial.

It is this last book—ostensibly about the expenditures of government—that shows most clearly what Smith had in mind politically; the government plays a much stronger role in society than is often asserted. In particular, book five addresses the importance of universal education and social unity. Smith calls for religious tolerance and social regulation against extremism. For Smith, religion is an exceptionally fractious force in society because individuals tend to regard theological leaders as having more authority than political ones. This leads to fragmentation and social discord.

The discussion of "public goods" includes an elaborate discussion of toll roads, which, on the face of it, may seem to be a boring topic, but actually includes a fascinating account of why tolls should be based on the value of transported goods rather than on weight. This is Smith's attempt to protect the poor—expensive goods are usually lighter than cheaper goods—think of diamonds compared to water—and if weight were the standard for tolls, justified, perhaps, by the wear and tear that the heavier goods cause, the poor would carry an undue share of transportation costs (WN V.i.d). However, the most intriguing sections of Book Five contain his two discussions of education (WN V.i.f–V.i.g). The first articulates the role of education for youth and the second describes the role of education for "people of all ages."

The government has no small interest in maintaining schools to teach basic knowledge and skills to young people. While some of the expense is born by parents, much of this is to be paid for by society as a whole (WN V.i.f.54-55). The government also has a duty to educate adults, both to help counter superstition and to remedy the effects of the division of labor. Regarding the first, an educated population is more resistant to the claims of extremist religions. Smith also advocates public scrutiny of religious assertions in an attempt to moderate their practices. This, of course, echoes Smith's moral theory in which the impartial spectator moderates the more extreme sentiments of moral agents. Finally, Smith insists that those who govern abandon associations with religious sects so that their loyalties do not conflict.

Regarding the second purpose of education for all ages, and again, anticipating Marx, Smith recognizes that the division of labor is destructive towards an individual's intellect. Without education, "the torpor" (inactivity) of the worker's mind:

renders him, not only incapable of relishing or bearing a part in any rational conversation, but of conceiving any generous, noble, or tender sentiment, and consequently of forming any just judgment concerning many even of the ordinary duties of private life. Of the great and extensive interests of his country, he is altogether incapable of judging; and unless very particular pains have been taken to render him otherwise, he is equally incapable of defending his country in war.... His dexterity at his own particular trade seems, in this manner, to be acquired at the expence of his intellectual, social, and martial virtues. But in every improved and civilized society this is the state into which the labouring poor, that is, the great body of the people, must necessarily fall, unless government takes some pains to prevent it. (WN V.i.f.50)

Education helps individuals overcome the monotony of day to day life. It helps them be better citizens, better soldiers, and more moral people; the intellect and the imagination are essential to moral judgment. No person can accurately sympathize if his or her mind is vacant and unskilled.

We see here that Smith is concerned about the poor throughout The Wealth of Nations. We also see the connections between his moral theory and his political economy. It is impossible to truly understand why Smith makes the political claims he does without connecting them to his moral claims, and vice versa. His call for universal wealth or opulence and his justification of limited government are themselves moral arguments as much as they are economic ones. This is why the Adam Smith Problem doesn't make sense and why contemporary Smith scholars are so focused on showing the systematic elements of Smith's philosophy. Without seeing how each of the parts fit together, one loses the power behind his reasoning—reasoning that inspired as much change as any other work in the history of the Western tradition. Of course, Smith has his detractors and his critics. He is making claims and building on assumptions that many challenge. But Smith has his defenders too, and, as history bears out, Smith is still an important voice in the investigation of how society ought to be organized and what principles govern human behavior, inquiry, and morality. The late twentieth century revival in Smith's studies underscores that Smith's philosophy may be as important now as it ever was.

4. References and Further Reading

All references are to The Glasgow Edition of the Correspondence and Works of Adam Smith, the definitive edition of his works. Online versions of much of these can be found at The Library of Economics and Liberty.

a. Work by Smith

  • [TMS] Theory of Moral Sentiments. Ed. A.L. Macfie and D.D. Raphael. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 1982.
    • First published in 1759; subsequent editions in 1761 (significantly revised), 1767, 1774, 1781, and 1790 (significantly revised with entirely new section).
  • [WN] An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations. 2 vols. Ed. R.H. Campbell and A.S. Skinner. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 1976.
    • First published in 1776; subsequent editions in 1778, 1784 (significantly revised), 1786, 1789.
  • [LJ] Lectures on Jurisprudence. Ed. R.L. Meek and D.D. Raphael. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 1982.
    • Contains two sets of lectures, LJ(A), dated 1762–3 and LJ(B) dated 1766.
  • [LRBL] The Lectures on Rhetoric and Belles Lettres. Ed. J.C. Bryce. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 1985.
    • Edition also contains the fragment: "Considerations Concerning the First Formation of Languages" in LRBL. Lecture dates, 1762–1763.
  • [EPS] Essays on Philosophical Subjects. Ed. W.P.D. Wightman and J.C. Bryce. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 1982.
    • Contains the essays and fragments: "The Principles Which Lead and Direct Philosophical Enquires Illustrated by the History of Astronomy," "The Principles Which Lead and Direct Philosophical Enquires Illustrated by the History of Ancient Physics," "ThePrinciples which lead and direct Philosophical Enquiries Illustrated by the History of the Ancient Logics and Metaphysics," "Of the External Senses," "Of the Nature of that Imitation which takes place in what are called The Imitative Arts," "Of the Affinity between Music, Dancing, and Poetry," "Of the Affinity between certain English and Italian Verses," Contributions to the Edinburgh Review of 1755-56, Review of Johnson's Dictionary, A Letter to the Authors of the Edinburgh Review, Preface and Dedication to William Hamilton's Poems on Several Occasions 261 and Dugald Stewart's "Account of the Life and Writings of Adam Smith, LL.D." First published in 1795.
  • [Corr.] Correspondence of Adam Smith. Ed. E.C. Mossner and I.S. Ross. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 1987.

b. Companion Volumes to the Glasgow Edition

  • Index to the Works of Adam Smith. Ed K. Haakonssen and A.S. Skinner. Indianapolis,: Liberty Press, 2002.
  • Essays on Adam Smith. Edited by A.S. Skinner and Thomas Wilson. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1976.
  • Life of Adam Smith. I.S. Ross. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.

c. Introductions and Works for a General Audience

  • Berry, Christopher J. The Social Theory of the Scottish Enlightenment. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
  • Fleischacker, Samuel. On Adam Smith's Wealth of Nations. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2004.
  • Haakonssen, K. (ed.) The Cambridge Companion to Adam Smith. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
  • Muller, Jerry Z. Adam Smith in His Time and Ours. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1993.
  • Otteson, James R. Adam Smith: Selected Philosophical Writings (Library of Scottish Philosophy). Exeter: Imprint Academic, 2004.
  • Weinstein, Jack Russell. On Adam Smith. Belmont: Wadsworth, 2001.
  • Raphael, D.D. Adam Smith (Past Masters). Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.

d. Recommended Books for Specialists

Any issue of the journal The Adam Smith Review will be of interest to Smith's readers. Volume 2 (2007) has a special symposium on Smith's notion of rational choice (economic deliberation), and Volume 3 (2008) will have a special symposium on Smith and education. Both may deserve special attention.

  • Campbell, T.D. Adam Smith's Science of Morals. New Jersey: Rowman and Littlefield, 1971.
  • Cropsey, Joseph. Polity and Economy: An Interpretation of the Principles of Adam Smith (With Further Thoughts on the Principles of Adam Smith) (Revised Edition). Chicago: St. Augustine's Press, 2001.
  • Evensky, J. Adam Smith's Moral Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Force, Pierre. Self-interest before Adam Smith. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Griswold, Charles L. Jr. Adam Smith and the Virtues of Enlightenment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Haakonssen, Knud (ed.). Adam Smith (The International Library of Critical Essays in the History of Philosophy. Aldershot: Ashgate/Dartmouth Publishing, 1998.
  • Haakonssen, Knud. The Science of A Legislator. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Montes, Leonidas. Adam Smith in Context. New York: Palgrave MacMillan, 2004.
  • Otteson, James. Adam Smith's Marketplace of Life. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Raphael, D.D. The Impartial Spectator. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
  • Scott, William Robert. Adam Smith as Student and Professor. New York: Augusts M. Kelley, 1965.
  • Teichgraeber, Richard. Free Trade and Moral Philosophy: Rethinking the Sources of Adam Smith's Wealth of Nations. Durham, Duke University Press, 1986.
  • Weinstein, Jack Russell. Adam Smith’s Pluralism: Rationality Education and the Moral Sentiments. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2013.

Author Information

Jack Russell Weinstein
University of North Dakota
U. S. A.

James Beattie (1735—1803)

beattieJames Beattie was a Scottish philosopher and poet who spent his entire academic career as Professor of Moral Philosophy and Logic at Marischal College in Aberdeen. His best known philosophical work, An Essay on The Nature and Immutability of Truth In Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism (1770), is a rhetorical tour de force which affirmed the sovereignty of common sense while attacking David Hume (1711-1776). A smash bestseller in its day, this Essay on Truth made Beattie very famous and Hume very angry. The work's fame proved fleeting, as did Beattie’s philosophical reputation.

While the Essay on Truth is little read today, it is well worth reading. First, it is an important document in the history of the Scottish common sense school of philosophy inaugurated by Beattie's colleague, Thomas Reid (1710-1796). Second, Beattie's style-- lively, polished, pure, and lucid--still has the power to please and charm. Finally, Beattie is an abler philosopher than his vociferous detractors were willing to allow. Though by no means an original or profound thinker, he can and should be given credit for presenting a systematic and accessible defense of a simple-sounding thesis - that philosophy cannot afford to despise the plain dictates of common sense.

This article (1) outlines Beattie's life and career, (2) reviews the basic argument of the Essay on Truth, (3) summarizes the Essay's neglected critique of Hume's racism, (4) briefly describes Beattie's later Elements of Moral Science, and (5) reflects on Beattie's place in the Scottish common sense school.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Career
  2. The Essay on Truth (1770)
  3. Beattie Contra Hume on Racism
  4. Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793)
  5. Beattie and Scottish Common Sense Philosophy
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Career

James Beattie was born October 25, 1735 in Laurencekirk, Kincardineshire, where his father was a farmer and shopkeeper. In 1749 Beattie began his studies at Marischal College, Aberdeen. In 1753, he was awarded the MA degree. He then spent several years as a schoolteacher and briefly contemplated becoming a minister. During this period he also secured the friendship of several influential personages. One of Beattie's early patrons was James Burnett (1714-1799), better known to posterity as Lord Monboddo (which name Burnett assumed when appointed to the Court of Session in 1767).

In 1760, at the tender age of 25, Beattie was installed as Professor of Moral Philosophy and Logic at Marischal College. Shortly thereafter he was elected to the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, known to waggish locals as “the Wise Club.” Founded in 1758 by Thomas Reid (1710-1796) and John Gregory (1724-1773), the Society continued to hold meetings until 1773, nine years after Reid left for Glasgow to fill the Chair of Moral Philosophy vacated by Adam Smith (1723-1790). Much of Beattie's later work had its origin in compositions read to his fellow Aberdonian “wise men” in the 1760s.

A decade after taking up his Professorship at Aberdeen, Beattie published the philosophical work for which he was (and is still) best known: An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth In Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism (1770) (hereinafter “Essay on Truth”). The honors piled up thick and fast: a doctorate of laws from Oxford; an audience with King George III; a Crown pension of 200 pounds a year; the approbation of discerning literati such as Edmund Burke and Samuel Johnson; and the opportunity to pose for Sir Joshua Reynolds. (Incidentally, Reynold's portrait of Beattie – “The Triumph of Truth, with the Portrait of a Gentleman”- was hung in Marischal College.) Nor was enthusiasm for Beattie's anti-skeptical treatise confined to the British Isles. The Essay was soon translated into French, German, and Dutch and discussed on the Continent. Beattie's fame spread to the New World as well. In 1784 he was made a member of the American Philosophical Society.

Not all citizens of the Republic of Letters, however, were impressed by the Essay on Truth. The book's target, the amiable and good-humored Hume, was incensed. “Truth!” he fumed, “there is no truth in it; it is a horrible large lie in Octavo.” Yet Hume, who had a policy of not answering critics, never deigned to reply directly to the cavils of “that bigoted silly fellow Beattie.” Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), too, had harsh words for Beattie. In Kant's Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783), the Scottish prophet of common sense is portrayed as a superficial, obtuse dogmatist: “I should think that Hume might fairly have laid as much claim to common sense as Beattie, and in addition to a critical reason (such as the latter did not possess).” (For the record, however, it should be noted that Kant (unlike Hume) had an equally low opinion of Reid.)

Beattie wrote no philosophical work equal to the Essay in appeal or influence, although he continued to publish throughout the 1770s and 1780s. Many of these ostensibly “later” works (several of which actually date from the 1760s) are devoted to issues in aesthetics, rhetoric, and literary theory. They include An Essay on Poetry and Music (1776), On the Utility of Classical Learning (1776), An Essay on Laughter, and Ludicrous Composition (1779), and Dissertations Moral and Critical (1783). In addition, he compiled a lexicon entitled Scotticisms, arranged in Alphabetical Order (1787), in which he urged his educated compatriots to improve their English by “purifying” it of Scots expressions.

Beattie also earned plaudits as a poet, largely on the strength of The Minstrel; or, The Progress of Genius, written in Spenserian stanzas. The first part of The Minstrel appeared anonymously in 1771 (a year which also saw two editions of the Essay printed). The second part, to which the author put his name, followed in 1774. Replete with reflections upon Nature and the character of poetic genius, The Minstrel anticipates some of the central preoccupations of the Romantic movement.

Despite his apparent “aesthetic turn” in the post-Essay period, Beattie remained interested in the broader philosophical, moral, and religious questions that had originally prompted him to compose the Essay on Truth in the 1760s. 1786 saw the publication of Evidences of the Christian Religion Briefly and Plainly Stated, a two volume work of popular apologetics. This was followed by his final book, Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793). A lengthy collection of lectures delivered at Marischal College, the Elements deal with a wide range of topics in the philosophy of mind, epistemology, metaphysics, logic, ethics, political philosophy, economics, and natural theology.

Beattie's later years were filled with affliction. His wife, Mary Beattie (née Dunn), went mad and was eventually committed to an asylum. Both of his children died, the elder son in 1790 and the younger in 1796. Weakened by grief, ill health, and a series of strokes, Beattie died in Aberdeen on August 18, 1803.

2. The Essay on Truth (1770)

The Essay on Truth begins predictably enough, with a definition of – what else?- truth. Truth, Beattie avows, is identified with what “the constitution of our nature determines us to believe”; falsehood is identified with what “the constitution of our nature determines us to disbelieve.” (Part I. i). The distinction between common sense and reason is drawn in terms of the way that distinct classes of truths are apprehended. Common sense is identified as “that faculty by which we perceive self-evident truth,” whereas reason is “that power by which we perceive truth in consequence of a proof.” (I. i). With these definitions securely in place, Beattie advances the Essay's principal thesis -- “common sense is the ultimate judge of truth,” (I. i) and reason must be subordinated to it. All sound reasoning, we are told, depends upon the principles of common sense:

In a word, the dictates of common sense are, in respect to human knowledge in general, what the axioms of geometry are in respect to mathematics: on the supposition that those axioms are false or dubious, all mathematical reasoning falls to the ground; and on the supposition that the dictates of common sense are erroneous and deceitful, all science, truth, and virtue, are vain. (I. ii. 9)

What are these axioms of common sense, these foundational principles on which all sound reasoning rests? It is not necessary to discuss all the principles listed in Beattie's catalogue of common sense. For the purpose of illustration, a representative sample of four “principles of common sense” should suffice: (i) the evidence of perception (or “external sense”) is not fallacious, but fundamentally reliable; (ii) whatever begins to exist, proceeds from some cause; (iii) Nature is uniform; and (iv) human testimony is basically trustworthy. Armed with this arsenal of principles, Beattie can now confidently enter the lists against an assortment of formidable philosophical foes. Beattie wielded principle (i) against skeptics (be they Cartesian or Humean), as well as against Berkeleyan idealists; principle (ii) against atheist critics of cosmological arguments; principle (iii) against Humean skeptics about induction; and principle (iv) against Humean scoffers at miracles.

If Beattie is right about common sense, much (if not all) of modern philosophy is wrong. The basic mistake of the moderns lies in their tendency to make reason, not common-sense, the ultimate judge or arbiter of truth. Reason is a shameless upstart who, ignorant of its proper station, disgraces itself by refusing to submit to authority (in the form of common sense). Such insubordination can only lead to chaos, catastrophe, and confusion:

When Reason invades the rights of Common Sense, and presumes to arraign that authority by which she herself acts, nonsense and confusion must of necessity ensue; science will soon come to have neither head nor tail, beginning nor end; philosophy will grow contemptible; and its adherents, far from being treated, as in former times, upon the footing of conjurers, will be thought by the vulgar, and by every man of sense, to be little better than downright fools. (I. ii. 9)

Philosophers therefore despise common sense at their peril. But how are we to distinguish genuine principles of common sense from the pretenders? Is Beattie suggesting that any cherished conviction or idée fixe that I am unable to prove automatically qualifies as a dictate of common sense? He endeavours to supply us with criteria or marks by which authentic principles of common sense can be identified. (1) We are irresistibly inclined by nature to believe the principles of common sense. Our powerful attachment to them, being spontaneous and quasi-instinctive, cannot be destroyed by philosophical argument - no matter how ingenious. (2) The principles of common sense are universally accepted. Far from being prejudices peculiar to a given time, place, culture, sect, or class, they have been believed by virtually all people in all ages. (3) The principles of common sense cannot be proven because they are epistemologically foundational or basic. They cannot be justified by reference to some more evident proposition(s), because none exist. (4) The principles of common sense are indispensable presuppositions of our conduct and practice. We cannot live or act prudently unless we assume that our senses are reliable, that human testimony can be a source of knowledge, that past will resemble the future, and so on. Anyone who actually doubted or denied such principles would put himself on par with the lunatic or the fool.

Here it may be asked: In what way does Beattie's Essay on Truth improve upon Thomas Reid's earlier Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (1764)? The short answer is that it does not. Beattie freely admits that he is heavily indebted to Reid. However, the Essay differs from the Inquiry in one obvious respect: Beattie's tract is infinitely more hard-hitting and caustic than anything ever penned by Reid. Where Reid writes respectfully of his opponents, Beattie tends to denounce and vilify them. Where Reid wraps up his subtle thoughts in restrained professorial prose, Beattie's simple arguments are presented with the spleen and verve of the born orator. These contrasts reflect a more basic difference between our two defenders of common sense. Unlike Reid, Beattie is first and foremost a moralist and an apologist. He is not interested in defending a subtle or nuanced philosophical thesis. Rather, Beattie is defending a lofty (albeit vaguely defined) cause - to wit, “the cause of truth, virtue, and mankind.” Translated into more prosaic (but precise) terms, Beattie's “cause” is that of deflecting philosophical opposition to a broadly Judeo-Christian understanding of human nature. According to this understanding, human beings are free but finite creatures made in the image of a good God or Creator. Neither brutes nor divinities, we occupy an intermediate place in creation and are better suited for action than for speculation. Inasmuch as our cognitive faculties are God-given, we may trust their deliverances - provided we acknowledge their limitations and exercise them under conditions that define our humble “middle state” (to quote Alexander Pope). Beattie's bold strategy in the Essay was to argue that these familiar ideas about human nature are unassailable because they rest on the solid and irrefragable foundation of “common sense” (rather than philosophic demonstrability). Here was a book apt to reassure the devout but timorous Christian reader, for it confidently announced that Humean scepticism – and the bulk of modern philosophy - was infinitely more suited to be ridiculed than to be feared.

3. Beattie Contra Hume on Racism

Although the Essay on Truth is largely devoted to re-instating the rights of common sense in the spheres of epistemology and metaphysics, it includes a forceful critique of Hume's racism.

Hume's racism? To some, this phrase may have a strange and novel sound. After all, Hume is usually portrayed as a patron saint of the Enlightenment: a genial cosmopolitan, sweetly reasonable, unfailingly courteous and amiable, “as approaching as nearly to the idea of a perfectly wise and virtuous man, as perhaps the nature of human frailty will permit” (in the oft-cited words of his friend, Adam Smith). Yet in Hume's essay “Of National Characters,” we catch a glimpse of a different side of le bon David. For there, in an infamous footnote, Hume writes:

I am apt to suspect the negroes to be naturally inferior to the whites. There scarcely ever was a civilized nation of that complexion, nor any individual, eminent either in action or speculation. No ingenious manufactures amongst them, no arts, no sciences ... [T]here are Negroe slaves dispersed all over Europe, of whom none ever discovered any symptoms of ingenuity.

In the Essay on Truth, Beattie condemns these sentiments: “These assertions are strong; but I know not whether they have anything else to recommend them.” (III. ii). Beattie does not stop there. Beattie does not merely fulminate against Hume's racism with a self-serving show of conspicuous indignation; instead he rolls up his sleeves and adroitly dissects Hume's pro-racist arguments. (1) Beattie disputes Hume's basic assertions about the achievements (or alleged lack thereof) of non-European societies: “[W]e know that these assertions are not true ... The Africans and Americans are known to have many ingenious manufactures and arts among them, which even Europeans would find it no easy matter to imitate.” (III. ii). (2) Moreover, Beattie says, Hume's reasoning is invalid. For even if Hume's claims were correct, his conclusion would not follow. “[O]ne may as well say of an infant, that he can never become a man, as of a nation now barbarous, that it never can be civilized.” (III. Ii). Should anyone doubt this, he need only recall that “[t]hat the inhabitants of Great Britain and France were as savage two thousand years ago, as those of Africa and America are at this day.” (III. ii). (3) Beattie is unimpressed by Hume's argument that “there are Negroe slaves dispersed all over Europe, of whom none ever discovered any symptoms of ingenuity.” Beattie insists that this claim is unwarranted as well as false. But even if it were true, it would not justify belief in Hume's natural inferiority thesis, for “the condition of a slave is not favourable to genius of any kind.” (III. ii). (4) While Beattie does not downgrade European achievements in the arts and sciences, he denies that they can be used to prove that European nations or “races” are superior. He stresses the extent that the achievements on which European nations pride themselves were either discovered by accident or the inventions of a gifted few, to whom alone all credit must go.

Beattie caps his rebuttal with two observations. First, his critique of Hume's natural inferiority thesis indirectly supports the cause of religion because such racism cannot be reconciled neatly with a true Judeo-Christian understanding of human nature. Second, Beattie stresses that his disagreement with Hume on the subject of racism is not merely theoretical or speculative. On the contrary, the dispute is intensely practical, for the natural inferiority thesis can (and frequently was) invoked to justify slavery - an institution that Beattie, a committed abolitionist, decried as “a barbarous piece of policy.”

4. Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793)

There is considerable overlap between the Essay on Truth and Beattie's later Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793). The creed of common sense is again soberly recited. We are told that consciousness, memory, and testimony must be taken as trustworthy, that we can assume that Nature is uniform, that we are free moral agents, and that whatever begins to exist must proceed from some cause.

Despite these and other doctrinal similarities, the Elements differs from the Essay in at least four respects. First, stylistically the Essay was full of sarcasm, scorn and splendid invective, while the Elements is comparatively tame, subdued, and dry. Second, the Elements is more philosophically constructive than the Essay, as Beattie now appears more interested in building and inhabiting his own modest system than in laying siege to the systems of foes and rivals. Third, the Elements offers a more in-depth exploration of several topics only lightly touched upon in the Essay (for example, perception, natural theology, and immortality). Finally, the Elements offers sustained coverage of several areas, such as political philosophy and economics, that are not meaningfully discussed in the Essay.

5. Beattie and Scottish Common Sense Philosophy

Historians of Scottish philosophy frequently describe Beattie's Essay as a simplified version of the philosophy of common sense expounded by Reid in his Inquiry of 1764. While there is much truth in this judgment, it need not be construed as a reproach. Popularization can be done well or badly. Beattie did it well.

Nevertheless, it is undeniable that Reid's views on matters philosophical evolved in a way that Beattie's never did. After retiring from teaching in 1781, Reid published two major works, Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785) and Essays on the Active Powers of Man (1788). More sophisticated and constructive than anything Beattie ever produced, these two books, along with Reid's earlier Inquiry, became the founding documents of the Scottish common sense school of philosophy. The Reidian gospel was soon propagated with aplomb by Edinburgh Chair-holder Dugald Stewart (1753-1828), who had listened to Reid's lectures in Glasgow. An elegant stylist, Stewart championed common sense both in his well-attended lectures and in his edifying books, the first pair of which - Elements of the Philosophy of the Human Mind (1792) and Outlines of Moral Philosophy (1793) - appeared around the same time as Beattie's Elements of Moral Science. Stewart's interest in Reid was shared by another renowned Edinburgh professor, the erudite but preternaturally verbose Sir William Hamilton (1788-1856). No slavish disciple, Hamilton sought to “improve” on Reid's philosophy in various ways, often by drawing on Kantian doctrines. A singular philosophical beast, the resulting hybrid was slain, stuffed, and mounted by John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) in An Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy (1865). Nevertheless, Hamilton's extensively (or, as some might say, obsessively) annotated edition of Reid's Collected Works did much to make them more widely available.

With Reid cast thus as the heroic founder of the emerging Scotch school, Beattie was relegated to the supporting role of ardent and skilful propagandist. This, at any rate, was how Dugald Stewart portrays Beattie in a letter to Sir William Forbes, Beattie's friend and biographer. Stewart declares that the Essay on Truth is effective as “a popular antidote against the illusions of metaphysical scepticism,” but, he is quick to add, Beattie's polemic lacks the subtlety, patience, and precision we find in Reid. Nevertheless, Stewart avers that Beattie's achievement is not negligible:

These critical remarks on the “Essay on Truth” (I must request you to observe) do not in the least affect the essential merits of that very valuable performance; and I have stated them with the greater freedom, because your late excellent friend possessed so many other unquestionable claims to high distinction – as a moralist, as a critic, as a grammarian, as a pure and classical writer, and, above all, as the author of the “Minstrel.” In any one of the different paths to which his ambition has led him, it would not perhaps be difficult to name some of his contemporaries by whom he has been surpassed; but where is the individual to be found, who has aspired with greater success to an equal variety of literary honours?

Stewart's verdict still seems a just one. Beattie was a talented, ambitious, and multi-faceted man of letters, but his gifts and merits as a philosopher were not the greatest. If philosophy is indeed “a series of footnotes to Plato” (Whitehead), then Beattie can be read as a dramatic footnote to Reid and - ironically - to the abhorred Hume.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cloyd, E. L. (1972) James Burnett, Lord Monboddo. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Touches on Monboddo's relationship with Beattie; indicates why their friendship did not last.
  • Fieser, J. (1994) “Beattie’s Lost Letter to the London Review,” Hume Studies 20: 1-12.
    • Reconstructs a controversy between Beattie and a pro-Humean literary faction.
  • Fieser, J. (2000) “Introduction” to James Beattie's Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth in Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism. Volume 2 of the 5 volume set, Scottish Common Sense Philosophy: Sources and Origins. (ed. J. Fieser) Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press.
    • Thorough presentation of Beattie's defence of common sense in the Essay on Truth.
  • Fieser, J. (ed.) (2000) Early Responses to Reid, Oswald, Beattie, and Stewart: I. Volume 3 of the 5 volume set, Scottish Common Sense Philosophy: Sources and Origins. Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press.
    • Contains early reviews of the Essay (including Edmund Burke's positive notice of the second edition of 1771).
  • Grave, S.A. (1960) The Scottish Philosophy of Common Sense. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Beattie's epistemological and metaphysical views are portrayed as vulgarized versions of Reid's.
  • Harris, J. A. (2002) “James Beattie, The Doctrine of Liberty, and the Science of the Mind,” Reid Studies (5): 16-29.
    • Acknowledges Beattie's shortcomings as a philosopher, but credits him with a commitment to understanding the human mind scientifically. Sheds light on the Essay's critique of necessitarianism.
  • King, E.H. (1971) “A Scottish “Philosophical” Club in the Eighteenth Century,” Dalhousie Review (50): 201-214.
    • Describes the inner workings of the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, and discusses Beattie's participation.
  • King, E.H. (1972) “James Beattie's Essay on Truth (1770): An Enlightenment “Bestseller”,” Dalhousie Review (51): 390-403.
    • An account of the Essay's popularity.
  • Kuehn, M. (1987) Scottish Common Sense in Germany, 1768-1800: A Contribution to the History of the Critical Philosophy. Kingston and Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.
    • Discusses the influence of Reid and, to a lesser extent, Beattie and Oswald upon Kant and his German contemporaries. A clear-headed, fair assessment of Beattie's strengths and weaknesses.
  • McCosh, J. (1875) The Scottish Philosophy. London: Macmillan.
    • Chapter XXIX contains a biographical sketch and an outline of the Essay. Depicts Beattie as an eloquent popularizer of the philosophy of common sense.
  • Mossner, E.C. (1980) The Life of David Hume. 2nd edition. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Briefly describes the reaction of Hume and his Edinburgh circle to the Essay's success.
  • Popkin, R.H. (1980) The High Road to Pyrrhonism. San Diego: Austin Hill Press.
    • Contains an article entitled “Hume's Racism” (pp. 251-266), in which Popkin helpfully puts Beattie's critique of Hume's racism in historical context.
  • Priestley, J. (1774) An Examination of Dr. Reid's Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense, Dr. Beattie's Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth, and Dr. Oswald's Appeal to Common Sense in Behalf of Religion. London: J. Johnson.
    • Includes an extended critique of Beattie, composed shortly after the Essay's publication. Priestley complains that the Essay's author is (among other things) an incorrigible dogmatist who relies too heavily on ad hominem arguments. The Appendix includes some correspondence between Beattie and Priestley.

Author Information

Douglas McDermid
Trent University

Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762—1814)

fichte_j_gJohann Gottlieb Fichte is one of the major figures in German philosophy in the period between Kant and Hegel. Initially considered one of Kant's most talented followers, Fichte developed his own system of transcendental philosophy, the so-called Wissenschaftslehre. Through technical philosophical works and popular writings Fichte exercised great influence over his contemporaries, especially during his years at the University of Jena. His influence waned towards the end of his life, and Hegel's subsequent dominance relegated Fichte to the status of a transitional figure whose thought helped to explain the development of German idealism from Kant's Critical philosophy to Hegel's philosophy of Spirit. Today, however, Fichte is more correctly seen as an important philosopher in his own right, as a thinker who carried on the tradition of German idealism in a highly original form.

Table of Contents

  1. Fichte's Beginnings (1762-1794)
    1. Early Life
    2. Fichte's Sudden Rise to Prominence
  2. The Jena Period (1794-1799)
    1. Fichte's Philosophical Vocation
    2. Fichte's System, the Wissenschaftslehre
    3. Background to the Wissenschaftslehre
    4. Working Out the Wissenschaftslehre and the End of the Jena Period
  3. The Berlin Period (1800-1814)
    1. The Eclipse of Fichte's Career
    2. Popular Writings from the Berlin Period
    3. Fichte's Return to the University and his Final Years
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Fichte's Writings in German
    2. Fichte's Writings in English Translation
    3. Other Philosophers' Writings in English Translation
    4. Suggested Secondary Literature in English, French, and German

1. Fichte's Beginnings (1762-1794)

a. Early Life

Fichte was born on May 19, 1762 to a family of ribbon makers. Early in life he impressed everyone with his great intelligence, but his parents were too poor to pay for his schooling. Through the patronage of a local nobleman, he was able to attend the Pforta school, which prepared students for a university education, and then the universities of Jena and Leipzig. Unfortunately, little is known about this period of Fichte's life, but we do know that he intended to obtain a degree in theology, and that he had to break off his studies for financial reasons around 1784, without obtaining a degree of any sort. Several years of earning his living as an itinerant tutor ensued, during which time he met Johanna Rahn, his future wife, while living in Zurich.

In the summer of 1790, while living in Leipzig and once again in financial distress, Fichte agreed to tutor a university student in the Kantian philosophy, about which he knew very little at the time. His immersion in Kant's writings, according to his own testimony, revolutionized his thinking and changed his life, turning him away from a deterministic view of the world at odds with human freedom towards the doctrines of the Critical philosophy and its reconciliation of freedom and determinism.

b. Fichte's Sudden Rise to Prominence

More wandering and frustration followed. Fichte decided to travel to Königsberg to meet Kant himself, and on July 4, 1791 the disciple had his first interview with the master. Unfortunately for Fichte, things did not go well, and Kant was not especially impressed by his visitor. In order to prove his expertise in the Critical philosophy, Fichte quickly composed a manuscript on the relation of the Critical philosophy to the question of divine revelation, an issue that Kant had yet to address in print. This time, Kant was justifiably impressed by the results and arranged for his own publisher to bring out the work, which appeared in 1792 under the title An Attempt at a Critique of all Revelation.

In this fledgling effort Fichte adhered to many of Kant's claims about morality and religion by thoughtfully extending them to the concept of revelation. In particular, he took over Kant's idea that all religious belief must ultimately withstand critical scrutiny if it is to make a legitimate claim on us. For Fichte, any alleged revelation of God's activity in the world must pass a moral test: namely, no immoral command or action, i.e., nothing that violates the moral law, can be attributed to Him. Although Fichte himself did not explicitly criticize Christianity by appealing to this test, such a restriction on the content of a possible revelation, if consistently imposed, would overturn some aspects of orthodox Christian belief, including, for example, the doctrine of original sin, which states that everyone is born guilty as a result of Adam and Eve's disobedience in the Garden of Eden. This element of Christian theology, which is said to be grounded in the revelations contained in the Bible, is hardly compatible with the view of justice underwritten by the moral law. Attentive readers should have instantly gleaned Fichte's radical views from the placid Kantian prose.

For reasons that are still mysterious, Fichte's name and preface were omitted from the first edition of An Attempt at a Critique of all Revelation, and thus the book, which displayed an extensive and subtle appreciation of Kant's thought, was taken to be the work of Kant himself. Once it became known that Fichte was the author, he instantly became a philosophical figure of importance; no one whose work had been mistaken for Kant's, however briefly, could be rightfully denied fame and celebrity in the German philosophical world.

Fichte continued working as a tutor while attempting to fashion his philosophical insights into a system of his own. He also anonymously published two political works, "Reclamation of the Freedom of Thought from the Princes of Europe, Who Have Oppressed It Until Now" and Contribution to the Rectification of the Public's Judgment of the French Revolution. It became widely known that he was their author; consequently, from the very beginning of his public career, he was identified with radical causes and views.

In October 1793 he married his fiancée, and shortly thereafter unexpectedly received a call from the University of Jena to take over the chair in philosophy that Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1758-1823), a well-known exponent and interpreter of the Kantian philosophy, had recently vacated. Fichte arrived in Jena in May 1794.

2. The Jena Period (1794-1799)

a. Fichte's Philosophical Vocation

In his years at Jena, which lasted until 1799, Fichte published the works that established his reputation as one of the major figures in the German philosophical tradition. Fichte never exclusively saw himself as an academic philosopher addressing the typical audience of fellow philosophers, university colleagues, and students. Instead, he considered himself a scholar with a wider role to play beyond the confines of academia, a view eloquently expressed in "Some Lectures Concerning the Scholar's Vocation," which were delivered to an overflowing lecture hall shortly after his much anticipated arrival in Jena. One of the tasks of philosophy, according to these lectures, is to offer rational guidance towards the ends that are most appropriate for a free and harmonious society. The particular role of the scholar — that is, of individuals such as Fichte himself, regardless of their particular academic discipline — is to be a teacher of mankind and a superintendent of its never-ending progress towards perfection.

Throughout his career Fichte alternated between composing, on the one hand, philosophical works for scholars and students of philosophy and, on the other hand, popular works for the general public. This desire to communicate to the wider public — to bridge the gap, so to speak, between theory and praxis — inspired his writings from the start. In fact, Fichte's passion for the education of society as a whole should be seen as a necessary consequence of his philosophical system, which continues the Kantian tradition of placing philosophy in the service of enlightenment, i.e., the eventual liberation of mankind from its self-imposed immaturity. To become mature, according to Kant's way of thinking, which Fichte had adopted, is to overcome our willing refusal to think for ourselves, and thus to accept responsibility for failing to think and act independently of the guidance of external authority.

b. Fichte's System, the Wissenschaftslehre

Fichte called his philosophical system the Wissenschaftslehre. The usual English translations of this term, such as "science of knowledge," "doctrine of science," or "theory of science," can be misleading, since today these phrases carry connotations that can be excessively theoretical or too reminiscent of the natural sciences. Therefore, many English-language commentators and translators prefer to use the German term as the untranslated proper name that designates Fichte's system as a whole.

Another potential source of confusion is that Fichte's book from 1794/95, whose full title is Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre, is sometimes simply referred to as the Wissenschaftslehre. Strictly speaking, this is incorrect, since this work, as its title indicates, was meant as the foundations of the system as a whole; the other parts of the system were to be written afterwards. Much of Fichte's work in the remainder of the Jena period attempted to complete the system as it was envisioned in the 1794/95 Foundations.

c. Background to the Wissenschaftslehre

Before moving to Jena, and while he was living in the house of his father-in-law in Zurich, Fichte wrote two short works that presaged much of the Wissenschaftslehre that he devoted the rest of his life to developing. The first of these was a review of a skeptical critique of Kantian philosophy in general and Reinhold's so-called Elementarphilosophie ("Elementary Philosophy") in particular. The work under review, an anonymously published polemic called Aenesidemus, which was later discovered to have been written by Gottlob Ernst Schulze (1761-1833), and which appeared in 1792, greatly influenced Fichte, causing him to revise many of his views, but did not lead him to abandon Reinhold's concept of philosophy as rigorous science, an interpretation of the nature of philosophy that demanded that philosophical principles be systematically derived from a single foundational principle known with certainty.

Reinhold had argued that this first principle was what he called the "principle of consciousness," namely, the proposition that "in consciousness representation is distinguished through the subject from both object and subject and is related to both." From this principle Reinhold attempted to deduce the contents of Kant's Critical philosophy. He claimed that the principle of consciousness was a reflectively known fact of consciousness, and argued that it could lend credence to various Kantian views, including the distinction between the faculties of sensibility and understanding and the existence of things in themselves. Schulze responded by offering skeptical objections against the legitimacy of Kant's (and thus Reinhold's) concept of the thing in itself (construed as the causal origin of our representations) and by arguing that the principle of consciousness was neither a fundamental principle (since it was subject to the laws of logic, in that it had to be free of contradiction) nor one known with certainty (since it originated in merely empirical reflection on the contents of consciousness, which reflection Schulze, following David Hume, persuasively argued could not yield a principle grounded on indubitable evidence).

Fichte, to his consternation, found himself in agreement with much of Schulze's critique. Although he was still eager to support the Kantian system, Fichte, as a result of reading Schulze, came to the conclusion that the Critical philosophy needed new foundations. Yet the search for new foundations, in Fichte's mind, was never equivalent to a repudiation of the Kantian philosophy. As Fichte would frequently claim, he remained true to the spirit, if not the letter, of Kant's thought. His review of Schulze's Aenesidemus provides one especially tantalizing hint about how he would subsequently attempt to remain within the spirit of Kant's thought while attempting to reconstruct it from the ground up: philosophy, he says, must begin with a first principle, as Reinhold maintained, but not with one that expresses a mere fact, a Tatsache; instead, Fichte countered, it must begin with a fact/act, a Tathandlung, that is not known empirically, but rather with self-evident certainty. The meaning and purpose of this new first principle would not become clear to his readers until the publication of the 1794/95 Foundations.

In addition to his review of the Schulze book, and still prior to his arrival in Jena, Fichte sketched out the nature and methodology of the Wissenschaftslehre in an essay entitled "Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre," which was intended to prepare his expectant audience for his classes and lectures. Here Fichte sets out his conception of philosophy as the science of science, i.e., as Wissenschaftslehre. The Wissenschaftslehre is devoted to establishing the foundation of individual sciences such as geometry, whose first principle is said to be the task of limiting space in accordance with a rule. Thus the Wissenschaftslehre seeks to justify the cognitive task of the science of geometry, i.e., its systematic efforts at spatial construction in the form of theorems validly deduced from axioms known with self-evident certainty. The Wissenschaftslehre, which itself is a science in need of a first principle, is said to be grounded on the Tathandlung first mentioned in the Aenesidemus review. The precise nature of this fact/act, with which the Wissenschaftslehre is supposed to begin, is much debated, even today. Yet it is the essential core of the Jena Wissenschaftslehre in general and the 1794/95 Foundations in particular.

d. Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre

In the 1794/95 Foundations Fichte expresses the content of the Tathandlung in its most general form as "the I posits itself absolutely." Fichte is suggesting that the self, which he typically refers to as "the I," is not a static thing with fixed properties, but rather a self-producing process. Yet if it is a self-producing process, then it also seems that it must be free, since in some as yet unspecified fashion it owes its existence to nothing but itself. This admittedly obscure starting point is subject to much scrutiny and qualification as the Wissenschaftslehre proceeds. In more modern language, and as a first approximation of its meaning, we can understand the Tathandlung as expressing the concept of a rational agent that constantly interprets itself in light of normative standards that it imposes on itself, in both the theoretical and practical realms, in its efforts to determine what it ought to believe and how it ought to act. (Fichte's indebtedness to the Kantian notion of autonomy in the form of self-imposed lawfulness should be obvious to anyone familiar with the Critical philosophy.)

Given the difficulty of the notion, unfortunately, Fichte's Tathandlung has perplexed his readers from its first appearance. The principle of the self-positing I was initially interpreted along the lines of Berkeley's idealism, and thus as claiming that the world as a whole is somehow the product of an infinite mind. This interpretation is surely mistaken, even though one can find passages that seem to support it. More important, though, is the question of the epistemic status of the principle. Is it known with the self-evident certainty that Fichte, following Reinhold, claims must ground any attempt at systematic knowledge? Furthermore, how does it serve as a basis for deducing the rest of the Wissenschaftslehre?

Fichte's method is sometimes said to be phenomenological, restricting itself to what we can discover by means of reflection. Yet Fichte does not claim that we simply find the fully formed Tathandlung residing somewhere within us; instead, we construct it in order to explain ourselves to ourselves, to render intelligible to ourselves our normative nature as finite rational beings. Thus the requisite reflection is not empirical but transcendental, i.e., an experimental postulate adopted for philosophical purposes. That is, the principle is presupposed as true in order to make sense of the conditions for the possibility of our ordinary experience.

Such a method leaves open the possibility of other explanations of our experience. Fichte claims, however, that the alternatives can actually take only one form. Either, he says, we can begin (as he does) with the I as the ground of all possible experience, or we can begin with the thing in itself outside of our experience. This dilemma involves, as he puts it, choosing between idealism and dogmatism. The former is transcendental philosophy; the latter, a naturalistic approach to experience that explains it solely in causal terms. As Fichte famously said in the first introduction to the Wissenschaftslehre from 1797, the choice between the two depends on the kind of person one is, because they are said to be mutually exclusive yet equally possible approaches.

If, however, such a choice between starting points is possible, then the principle of the self-positing I lacks the self-evident certainty that Fichte attributed to it in his earlier essay on the concept of the Wissenschaftslehre. There are, in fact, those who do not find it at all self-evident, namely, the dogmatists. Fichte clearly thinks that they are mistaken in their dogmatism, yet he offers no direct refutation of their position, claiming only that they cannot demonstrate what they hope to demonstrate, namely, that the ground of all experience lies solely in objects existing independently of the I. The dogmatist position, Fichte implies, ignores the normative aspects of our experience, e.g., warranted and unwarranted belief, correct and incorrect action, and thus attempts to account for our experience entirely in terms of our causal interaction with the world around us. Presumably, however, those who begin with a disavowal of normativity — as the dogmatists do, because they are that kind of person — can never be brought to agree with the idealists. There is thus an argumentative impasse between the two camps.

Fichte's remarks about systematic form and certainty in "Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre" give the impression that he intends to demonstrate the entirety of the Wissenschaftslehre from the principle of the self-positing I through a chain of logical inferences that merely set out the implications of the initial principle in such a way that the certainty of the first principle is transferred to the claims inferred from it. (The method of Spinoza's Ethics comes to mind, but this time with only a single premise from which to begin the proofs.) Yet this hardly seems to be Fichte's actual method, since he constantly introduces new concepts that cannot be plausibly interpreted as the logical consequences of the previous ones. In other words, the deductions in the Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre are more than merely analytical explications of the consequences of the original premise. Instead, they both articulate and refine the initial principle of the self-positing I in accordance with the demands made on the idealist who is attempting to clarify the nature of the self-positing I by means of reflection.

After Fichte postulates the self-positing I as the explanatory ground of all experience, he then begins to complicate the web of concepts required to make sense of this initial postulate, thereby carrying out the aforementioned construction of the self-positing I. The I posits itself insofar as it is aware of itself, not only as an object but also as a subject, and finds itself subject to normative constraints in both the theoretical and practical realms, e.g., that it must be free of contradiction and that there must be adequate reasons for what it believes and does. Furthermore, the I posits itself as free, since these constraints are ones that it imposes on itself. Next, by means of further reflection, the I becomes aware of a difference between "representations accompanied by a feeling of necessity" and "representations accompanied by a feeling a freedom" — that is, a difference between representations of what purports to be an objective world existing apart from our representations of it and representations that are merely the product of our own mental activity. To recognize this distinction in our representations, however, is to posit a distinction between the I and the not-I, i.e., the self and whatever exists independently of it. In other words, the I comes to posit itself as limited by something other than itself, even though it initially posits itself as free, for in the course of reflecting on its own nature the I discovers limitations on its activity.

Our understanding of the nature of this limitation is made increasingly more complex through further acts of reflection. First, the I posits a check, an Anstoß, on its theoretical and practical activity, in that it encounters resistance whenever it thinks or acts. This check is then developed into more refined forms of limitation: sensations, intuitions, and concepts, all united in the experience of the things of the natural world, i.e., the spatio-temporal realm ruled by causal laws. Moreover, this world is found to contain other finite rational beings. They too are free yet limited, and the recognition of their freedom places further constraints on our activity. In this way the I posits the moral law and restricts its treatment of others to actions that are consistent with respect for their freedom. Thus, by the end of Fichte's deductions, the I posits itself as free yet limited by natural necessity and the moral law: its freedom becomes an infinite task in which it seeks to make the world conform to its normative standards, but only by doing so in an appropriately moral fashion that allows other free beings to do the same for themselves.

e. Working Out the Wissenschaftslehre and the End of the Jena Period

Fichte's writings during the rest of the Jena period attempt to fill out and refine the entire system. The Foundations of Natural Right Based on the Wissenschaftslehre (1796/97) and The System of Ethical Theory Based on the Wissenschaftslehre (1798) concern themselves with political philosophy and moral philosophy, respectively. The task of the former work is to characterize the legitimate constraints that can be placed on individual freedom in order to produce a community of maximally free individuals who simultaneously respect the freedom of others. The task of the latter work is to characterize the specific duties of rational agents who freely produce objects and actions in the pursuit of their goals. These duties follow from our general obligation to determine ourselves freely, i.e., from the categorical imperative.

Besides filling out projected portions of the system, Fichte also began to revise the foundations themselves. Since he considered the mode of presentation of the Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre unsatisfactory, he began drawing up a new version in his lectures, which were given three times between 1796 and 1799, but which he never managed to publish. These lectures, which in some respects are superior to the Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre, were published posthumously and are now known as the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo.

Prior to publishing any systematic presentation of his philosophy of religion, Fichte became embroiled in what is now known as the Atheismusstreit, the atheism controversy. In an essay from 1798 entitled "On the Basis of Our Belief in a Divine Governance of the World" Fichte argued that religious belief could be legitimate only insofar as it arose from properly moral considerations — a view clearly indebted to his book on revelation from 1792. Furthermore, he claimed that God has no existence apart from the moral world order. Because neither view was orthodox at the time, Fichte was accused of atheism and ultimately forced to leave Jena.

Two open letters, both from 1799 and written by philosophers whom Fichte fervently admired, compounded his troubles. First, Kant disavowed the Wissenschaftslehre for mistakenly having tried to infer substantive philosophical knowledge from logic alone. Such an inference, he claimed, was impossible, since logic abstracted from the content of knowledge and thus could not produce a new object of knowledge. Second, Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi accused the Wissenschaftslehre of nihilism: that is, of producing reality out of mere mental representations, and thus in effect from nothingness. Whether or not these criticisms were just (and Fichte certainly denied that they were), they further damaged Fichte's philosophical reputation.

3. The Berlin Period (1800-1814)

a. The Eclipse of Fichte's Career

In 1800 Fichte settled in Berlin and continued to philosophize. He was no longer a professor, because there was no university in Berlin at the time of his arrival. To earn a living, he published new works and gave private lectures. The Berlin years, while productive, represent a decline in Fichte's fortunes, since he never regained the degree of influence among philosophers that he had enjoyed during the Jena years, although he remained a popular author among non-philosophers. His first major Berlin publication was a popular presentation of the Wissenschaftslehre designed to answer his critics on the question of atheism. Known as The Vocation of Man, it appeared in 1800 and is probably Fichte's greatest literary production. (It seems, although this is never explicitly stated anywhere in the book, that much of it was inspired by the personally stinging critique of Jacobi's open letter.)

Fichte continued to revise the Wissenschaftslehre, yet he published very little of the material developed in these renewed efforts to perfect his system, mostly because he feared being misunderstood as he had been during the Jena years. His reluctance to publish gave his contemporaries the false impression that he was more or less finished as an original philosopher. Except for a cryptic outline that appeared in 1810, his Berlin lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre, of which there are numerous versions, only appeared posthumously. In these manuscripts Fichte typically speaks of the absolute and its appearances, i.e., a philosophically suitable stand-in for a more traditional notion of God and the community of finite rational beings whose existence is grounded in the absolute. As a result, Fichte is sometimes said to have taken a religious turn in the Berlin period.

b. Popular Writings from the Berlin Period

In 1806 Fichte published two lecture series that were well-received by his contemporaries. The first, The Characteristics of the Present Age, employs the Wissenschaftslehre for the purposes of the philosophy of history. According to Fichte, there are five stages of history in which the human race progresses from the rule of instinct to the rule of reason. The present age, he says, is the third age, an epoch of liberation from instinct and external authority, out of which humanity will ultimately progress until it makes itself and the world it inhabits into a fully self-conscious representative of the life of reason. The second, The Way Towards the Blessed Life, which is sometimes said to be a mystical work, treats of morality and religion in a popular format.

Another famous series of lectures, Addresses to the German Nation, given in 1808 during the French occupation, was intended as a continuation of The Characteristics of the Present Age, but exclusively for a German audience. Here Fichte envisions a new form of national education that would enable the German nation, not yet in existence, to reach the fifth and final age outlined in the earlier lecture series. Once again, Fichte demonstrated his interest in larger matters, and in a manner perfectly consistent with his earlier insistence from the Jena period that the scholar has a cultural role to play.

c. Fichte's Return to the University and his Final Years

When the newly founded Prussian university in Berlin opened in 1810, Fichte was made the head of the philosophy faculty; in 1811 he was elected the first rector of the university. He continued his philosophical work until the very end of his life, lecturing on the Wissenschaftslehre and writing on political philosophy and other subjects. When the War of Liberation broke out in 1813, Fichte canceled his lectures and joined the militia. His wife Johanna, who was serving as a volunteer nurse in a military hospital, contracted a life-threatening fever. She recovered, but Fichte fell ill with the same ailment. He died on January 29, 1814.

4. Conclusion

Although Fichte's importance for the history of German philosophy is undisputed, the nature of his legacy is still very much debated. He has sometimes been seen as a mere transitional figure between Kant and Hegel, as little more than a philosophical stepping stone along Spirit's path to absolute knowledge. This understanding of Fichte was encouraged by Hegel himself, and no doubt for self-serving reasons. Nowadays, however, Fichte is studied more and more for his own sake, in particular for his theory of subjectivity, i.e., the theory of the self-positing I, which is rightly seen as a sophisticated elaboration of Kant's claim that finite rational beings are to be interpreted in theoretical and practical terms. The level of detail that Fichte provides on these matters exceeds that found in Kant's writings. This fact alone would make Fichte's work worthy of our attention. Yet perhaps the most persuasive testament to Fichte's greatness as a philosopher is to be found in his relentless willingness to begin again, to start the Wissenschaftslehre anew, and never to rest content with any prior formulation of his thought. Although this leaves his readers perpetually dissatisfied and desirous of a definitive statement of his views, Fichte, true to his publically declared vocation, makes them into better philosophers through his own example of restless striving for the truth.

5. Suggestions for Further Reading

a. Fichte's Writings in German

  • Gesamtausgabe der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften. Ed. R. Lauth, H. Jacobs, and H. Gliwitzky. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann, 1964ff.
  • Fichtes Werke, 11 vols. Ed. Immanuel Hermann Fichte. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter & Co., 1971.
    • Reprint of the 19th century edition of Fichte's writings.

b. Fichte's Writings in English Translation

(Publication dates during Fichte's lifetime are given in brackets.)

  • Fichte: Early Philosophical Writings [1790-1799]. Trans. and ed. Daniel Breazeale. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1988.
    • Includes "Review of Aenesidemus," "Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre," and "Some Lectures Concerning the Scholar's Vocation."
  • Attempt at a Critique of all Revelation [17921, 17932]. Trans. Garrett Green. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1978.
  • "Reclamation of the Freedom of Thought from the Princes of Europe, Who Have Oppressed It Until Now" [1793]. Trans. Thomas E. Wartenberg. In What is Enlightenment? Eighteenth-Century Answers and Twentieth-Century Questions, ed. James Schmidt. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996.
  • "On the Spirit and the Letter in Philosophy" [1794]. Trans. Elizabeth Rubenstein. In German Aesthetic and Literary Criticism: Kant, Fichte, Schelling, Schopenhauer, Hegel, ed. David Simpson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Foundations of the Entire Science of Knowledge [1794/95]. In The Science of Knowledge, trans. and ed. Peter Heath and John Lachs. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
    • Also includes the two introductions to the Wissenschaftslehre from 1797.
  • "On the Linguistic Capacity and the Origin of Language" [1795]. In Language and German Idealism: Fichte's Linguistic Philosophy, trans. and ed. Jere Paul Surber. Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press, 1996.
  • Foundations of Transcendental Philosophy (Wissenschaftslehre) nova methodo (1796/99). Trans. and ed. Daniel Breazeale. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
    • Posthumously published lectures given between 1796 and 1799.
  • Foundations of Natural Right [1796/97]. Trans. Michael Baur, ed. Frederick Neuhouser. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Introductions to the Wissenschaftslehre and Other Writings [1797-1800]. Trans. and ed. Daniel Breazeale. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1994.
    • Includes the two introductions to the Wissenschaftslehre from 1797 as well as "On the Basis of Our Belief in a Divine Governance of the World" from 1798.
  • The Science of Ethics as Based on the Science of Knowledge [1798]. Trans. A E. Kroeger. London: Kegan Paul, 1897.
    • German title would be better translated as The System of Ethical Theory Based on the Wissenschaftslehre. An unreliable translation.
  • The Vocation of Man [1800]. Trans. Peter Preuss. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1987.
  • "A Crystal Clear Report to the General Public Concerning the Actual Essence of the Newest Philosophy: An Attempt to Force the Reader to Understand" [1801]. Trans. John Botterman and William Rasch. In Philosophy of German Idealism, ed. Ernst Behler. New York: Continuum, 1987.
  • The Characteristics of the Present Age and The Way Towards the Blessed Life [1806]. In The Popular Works of Johann Gottlieb Fichte, 2 vols., trans. and ed. William Smith. London: Chapman, 1848/49. Reprint ó London: Thoemmes Press, 1999.
  • Addresses to the German Nation [1808]. Trans. R. F. Jones and G. H. Turnbull. Chicago: Open Court, 1922. Reprint ó Westport, CT: Greenwood Press, Inc., 1979.
  • "The Science of Knowledge in its General Outline" [1810]. Trans. Walter E. Wright. Idealistic Studies 6 (1976): 106-117.

c. Other Philosophers' Writings in English Translation

  • Di Giovanni, George and H. S. Harris, eds. Between Kant and Hegel: Texts in the Development of Post-Kantian Idealism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1985. Revised edition ó Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 2000.
    • Includes excerpts from Reinhold's The Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge and Schulze's Aenesidemus.
  • Jacobi, Friedrich Heinrich. The Main Philosophical Writings and the Novel Allwill. Trans. and ed. George di Giovanni. Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press, 1994.
    • Includes Jacobi to Fichte.

d. Suggested Secondary Literature in English, French, and German

  • Baumanns, Peter. J. G. Fichte: Kritische Gesamtdarstellung seiner Philosophie. Freiburg/M¸nchen: Verlag Karl Alber, 1990.
  • Beiser, Frederick C. German Idealism: The Struggle Against Subjectivism, 1781-1801. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 2002.
    • Part II interprets the Wissenschaftslehre from the point of view of Fichte's critique of subjectivism.
  • Bowman, Curtis. "Johann Gottlieb Fichte: Foundations of the Entire Science of Knowledge." In Central Works of Philosophy (Volume 3: The Nineteenth Century), ed. John Shand. Chesham: Acumen Publishing Limited, 2005.
    • An interpretation of Fichte's best known book, suitable for first-time readers.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. "Fichte and Schelling: The Jena Period." In The Age of German Idealism (Routledge History of Philosophy, Volume VI), ed. Robert C. Solomon and Kathleen M. Higgins. London: Routledge, 1993.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. "Fichte, Johann Gottlieb." In Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 3. London: Routledge, 1998.
  • Breazeale, Daniel and Tom Rockmore, eds. Fichte: Historical Contexts/Contemporary Controversies. Atlantic Highlands, New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1994.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. New Essays in Fichte's Foundation of the Entire Doctrine of Scientific Knowledge. Amherst, New York: Humanity Books, 2001.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. New Essays on Fichte's Later Jena Wissenschaftslehre. Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 2002.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. New Perspectives on Fichte. New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1996.
  • Henrich, Dieter. "Fichte's Original Insight." Trans. David Lachterman. Contemporary German Philosophy 1 (1982): 15-53.
  • Jacobs, Wilhelm G. Johann Gottlieb Fichte. Reinbek bei Hamburg: Rowohlt, 1984.
    • A brief illustrated biography.
  • La Vopa, Anthony J. Fichte: The Self and the Calling of Philosophy, 1762-1799. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
    • Intellectual biography of Fichte's early life and the Jena period.
  • Martin, Wayne. Idealism and Objectivity: Understanding Fichte's Jena Project. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
  • Neuhouser, Frederick. Fichte's Theory of Subjectivity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
  • Philonenko, Alexis. L'oevre de Fichte. Paris: Libraire Philosophique J. Vrin, 1984.
  • Pinkard, Terry. German Philosophy, 1760-1860: The Legacy of Idealism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
    • Chapter 5 is devoted to Fichte.
  • Rohs, Peter. Johann Gottlieb Fichte. Munich: C. H. Beck, 1991.
  • Seidel, George. Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre of 1794: A Commentary on Part I. West Lafayette, Indiana: Purdue University Press, 1993.
  • Zöller, Günter. Fichte's Transcendental Philosophy: The Original Duplicity of Intelligence and Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.

Author Information

Curtis Bowman
U. S. A.

Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712—1778)

rousseauJean-Jacques Rousseau was one of the most influential thinkers during the Enlightenment in eighteenth century Europe. His first major philosophical work, A Discourse on the Sciences and Arts, was the winning response to an essay contest conducted by the Academy of Dijon in 1750. In this work, Rousseau argues that the progression of the sciences and arts has caused the corruption of virtue and morality. This discourse won Rousseau fame and recognition, and it laid much of the philosophical groundwork for a second, longer work, The Discourse on the Origin of Inequality. The second discourse did not win the Academy’s prize, but like the first, it was widely read and further solidified Rousseau’s place as a significant intellectual figure. The central claim of the work is that human beings are basically good by nature, but were corrupted by the complex historical events that resulted in present day civil society.Rousseau’s praise of nature is a theme that continues throughout his later works as well, the most significant of which include his comprehensive work on the philosophy of education, the Emile, and his major work on political philosophy, The Social Contract: both published in 1762. These works caused great controversy in France and were immediately banned by Paris authorities. Rousseau fled France and settled in Switzerland, but he continued to find difficulties with authorities and quarrel with friends. The end of Rousseau’s life was marked in large part by his growing paranoia and his continued attempts to justify his life and his work. This is especially evident in his later books, The Confessions, The Reveries of the Solitary Walker, and Rousseau: Judge of Jean-Jacques.

Rousseau greatly influenced Immanuel Kant’s work on ethics. His novel Julie or the New Heloise impacted the late eighteenth century’s Romantic Naturalism movement, and his political ideals were championed by leaders of the French Revolution.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
    1. Traditional Biography
    2. The Confessions: Rousseau’s Autobiography
  2. Background
    1. The Beginnings of Modern Philosophy and the Enlightenment
    2. The State of Nature as a Foundation for Ethics and Political Philosophy
  3. The Discourses
    1. Discourse on the Sciences and Arts
    2. Discourse on the Origin of Inequality
    3. Discourse on Political Economy
  4. The Social Contract
    1. Background
    2. The General Will
    3. Equality, Freedom, and Sovereignty
  5. The Emile
    1. Background
    2. Education
    3. Women, Marriage, and Family
    4. The Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar
  6. Other Works
    1. Julie or the New Heloise
    2. Reveries of the Solitary Walker
    3. Rousseau: Judge of Jean Jacques
  7. Historical and Philosophical Influence
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Rousseau
    2. Works about Rousseau

1. Life

a. Traditional Biography

Jean-Jacques Rousseau was born to Isaac Rousseau and Suzanne Bernard in Geneva on June 28, 1712. His mother died only a few days later on July 7, and his only sibling, an older brother, ran away from home when Rousseau was still a child. Rousseau was therefore brought up mainly by his father, a clockmaker, with whom at an early age he read ancient Greek and Roman literature such as the Lives of Plutarch. His father got into a quarrel with a French captain, and at the risk of imprisonment, left Geneva for the rest of his life. Rousseau stayed behind and was cared for by an uncle who sent him along with his cousin to study in the village of Bosey. In 1725, Rousseau was apprenticed to an engraver and began to learn the trade. Although he did not detest the work, he thought his master to be violent and tyrannical. He therefore left Geneva in 1728, and fled to Annecy. Here he met Louise de Warens, who was instrumental in his conversion to Catholicism, which forced him to forfeit his Genevan citizenship (in 1754 he would make a return to Geneva and publicly convert back to Calvanism). Rousseau’s relationship to Mme. de Warens lasted for several years and eventually became romantic. During this time he earned money through secretarial, teaching, and musical jobs.

In 1742 Rousseau went to Paris to become a musician and composer. After two years spent serving a post at the French Embassy in Venice, he returned in 1745 and met a linen-maid named Therese Levasseur, who would become his lifelong companion (they eventually married in 1768). They had five children together, all of whom were left at the Paris orphanage. It was also during this time that Rousseau became friendly with the philosophers Condillac and Diderot. He worked on several articles on music for Diderot and d’Alembert’s Encyclopedie. In 1750 he published the Discourse on the Arts and Sciences, a response to the Academy of Dijon’s essay contest on the question, “Has the restoration of the sciences and arts tended to purify morals?” This discourse is what originally made Rousseau famous as it won the Academy’s prize. The work was widely read and was controversial. To some, Rousseau’s condemnation of the arts and sciences in the First Discourse made him an enemy of progress altogether, a view quite at odds with that of the Enlightenment project. Music was still a major part of Rousseau’s life at this point, and several years later, his opera, Le Devin du Village (The Village Soothsayer) was a great success and earned him even more recognition. But Rousseau attempted to live a modest life despite his fame, and after the success of his opera, he promptly gave up composing music.

In the autumn of 1753, Rousseau submitted an entry to another essay contest announced by the Academy of Dijon. This time, the question posed was, “What is the origin of inequality among men, and is it authorized by the natural law?” Rousseau’s response would become the Discourse on the Origin of Inequality Among Men. Rousseau himself thought this work to be superior to the First Discourse because the Second Discourse was significantly longer and more philosophically daring. The judges were irritated by its length as well its bold and unorthodox philosophical claims; they never finished reading it. However, Rousseau had already arranged to have it published elsewhere and like the First Discourse, it also was also widely read and discussed.

In 1756, a year after the publication of the Second Discourse, Rousseau and Therese Levasseur left Paris after being invited to a house in the country by Mme. D’Epinay, a friend to the philosophes. His stay here lasted only a year and involved an affair with a woman named Sophie d’Houdetot, the mistress of his friend Saint-Lambert. In 1757, after repeated quarrels with Mme. D’Epinay and her other guests including Diderot, Rousseau moved to lodgings near the country home of the Duke of Luxemburg at Montmorency.

It was during this time that Rousseau wrote some of his most important works. In 1761 he published a novel, Julie or the New Heloise, which was one of the best selling of the century. Then, just a year later in 1762, he published two major philosophical treatises: in April his definitive work on political philosophy, The Social Contract, and in May a book detailing his views on education, Emile. Paris authorities condemned both of these books, primarily for claims Rousseau made in them about religion, which forced him to flee France. He settled in Switzerland and in 1764 he began writing his autobiography, his Confessions. A year later, after encountering difficulties with Swiss authorities, he spent time in Berlin and Paris, and eventually moved to England at the invitation of David Hume. However, due to quarrels with Hume, his stay in England lasted only a year, and in 1767 he returned to the southeast of France incognito.

After spending three years in the southeast, Rousseau returned to Paris in 1770 and copied music for a living. It was during this time that he wrote Rousseau: Judge of Jean-Jacques and the Reveries of the Solitary Walker, which would turn out to be his final works. He died on July 3, 1778. His Confessions were published several years after his death; and his later political writings, in the nineteenth century.

b. The Confessions: Rousseau’s Autobiography

Rousseau’s own account of his life is given in great detail in his Confessions, the same title that Saint Augustine gave his autobiography over a thousand years earlier. Rousseau wrote the Confessions late in his career, and it was not published until after his death. Incidentally, two of his other later works, the “Reveries of the Solitary Walker” and “Rousseau Judge of Jean Jacques” are also autobiographical. What is particularly striking about the Confessions is the almost apologetic tone that Rousseau takes at certain points to explain the various public as well as private events in his life, many of which caused great controversy. It is clear from this book that Rousseau saw the Confessions as an opportunity to justify himself against what he perceived as unfair attacks on his character and misunderstandings of his philosophical thought.

His life was filled with conflict, first when he was apprenticed, later in academic circles with other Enlightenment thinkers like Diderot and Voltaire, with Parisian and Swiss authorities and even with David Hume. Although Rousseau discusses these conflicts, and tries to explain his perspective on them, it is not his exclusive goal to justify all of his actions. He chastises himself and takes responsibility for many of these events, such as his extra-marital affairs. At other times, however, his paranoia is clearly evident as he discusses his intense feuds with friends and contemporaries. And herein lays the fundamental tension in the Confessions. Rousseau is at the same time trying both to justify his actions to the public so that he might gain its approval, but also to affirm his own uniqueness as a critic of that same public.

2. Background

a. The Beginnings of Modern Philosophy and the Enlightenment

Rousseau’s major works span the mid to late eighteenth century. As such, it is appropriate to consider Rousseau, at least chronologically, as an Enlightenment thinker. However, there is dispute as to whether Rousseau’s thought is best characterized as “Enlightenment” or “counter-Enlightenment.” The major goal of Enlightenment thinkers was to give a foundation to philosophy that was independent of any particular tradition, culture, or religion: one that any rational person would accept. In the realm of science, this project has its roots in the birth of modern philosophy, in large part with the seventeenth century philosopher, René Descartes. Descartes was very skeptical about the possibility of discovering final causes, or purposes, in nature. Yet this teleological understanding of the world was the very cornerstone of Aristotelian metaphysics, which was the established philosophy of the time. And so Descartes’ method was to doubt these ideas, which he claims can only be understood in a confused way, in favor of ideas that he could conceive clearly and distinctly. In the Meditations, Descartes claims that the material world is made up of extension in space, and this extension is governed by mechanical laws that can be understood in terms of pure mathematics.

b. The State of Nature as a Foundation for Ethics and Political Philosophy

The scope of modern philosophy was not limited only to issues concerning science and metaphysics. Philosophers of this period also attempted to apply the same type of reasoning to ethics and politics. One approach of these philosophers was to describe human beings in the “state of nature.” That is, they attempted to strip human beings of all those attributes that they took to be the results of social conventions. In doing so, they hoped to uncover certain characteristics of human nature that were universal and unchanging. If this could be done, one could then determine the most effective and legitimate forms of government.

The two most famous accounts of the state of nature prior to Rousseau’s are those of Thomas Hobbes and John Locke. Hobbes contends that human beings are motivated purely by self-interest, and that the state of nature, which is the state of human beings without civil society, is the war of every person against every other. Hobbes does say that while the state of nature may not have existed all over the world at one particular time, it is the condition in which humans would be if there were no sovereign. Locke’s account of the state of nature is different in that it is an intellectual exercise to illustrate people’s obligations to one another. These obligations are articulated in terms of natural rights, including rights to life, liberty and property. Rousseau was also influenced by the modern natural law tradition, which attempted to answer the challenge of skepticism through a systematic approach to human nature that, like Hobbes, emphasized self-interest. Rousseau therefore often refers to the works of Hugo Grotius, Samuel von Pufendorf, Jean Barbeyrac, and Jean-Jacques Burlamaqui. Rousseau would give his own account of the state of nature in the Discourse on the Origin and Foundations of Inequality Among Men, which will be examined below.

Also influential were the ideals of classical republicanism, which Rousseau took to be illustrative of virtues. These virtues allow people to escape vanity and an emphasis on superficial values that he thought to be so prevalent in modern society. This is a major theme of the Discourse on the Sciences and Arts.

3. The Discourses

a. Discourse on the Sciences and Arts

This is the work that originally won Rousseau fame and recognition. The Academy of Dijon posed the question, “Has the restoration of the sciences and arts tended to purify morals?” Rousseau’s answer to this question is an emphatic “no.” The First Discourse won the academy’s prize as the best essay. The work is perhaps the greatest example of Rousseau as a “counter-Enlightenment” thinker. For the Enlightenment project was based on the idea that progress in fields like the arts and sciences do indeed contribute to the purification of morals on individual, social, and political levels.

The First Discourse begins with a brief introduction addressing the academy to which the work was submitted. Aware that his stance against the contribution of the arts and sciences to morality could potentially offend his readers, Rousseau claims, “I am not abusing science…I am defending virtue before virtuous men.” (First Discourse, Vol. I, p. 4). In addition to this introduction, the First Discourse is comprised of two main parts.

The first part is largely an historical survey. Using specific examples, Rousseau shows how societies in which the arts and sciences flourished more often than not saw the decline of morality and virtue. He notes that it was after philosophy and the arts flourished that ancient Egypt fell. Similarly, ancient Greece was once founded on notions of heroic virtue, but after the arts and sciences progressed, it became a society based on luxury and leisure. The one exception to this, according to Rousseau, was Sparta, which he praises for pushing the artists and scientists from its walls. Sparta is in stark contrast to Athens, which was the heart of good taste, elegance, and philosophy. Interestingly, Rousseau here discusses Socrates, as one of the few wise Athenians who recognized the corruption that the arts and sciences were bringing about. Rousseau paraphrases Socrates’ famous speech in the Apology. In his address to the court, Socrates says that the artists and philosophers of his day claim to have knowledge of piety, goodness, and virtue, yet they do not really understand anything. Rousseau’s historical inductions are not limited to ancient civilizations, however, as he also mentions China as a learned civilization that suffers terribly from its vices.

The second part of the First Discourse is an examination of the arts and sciences themselves, and the dangers they bring. First, Rousseau claims that the arts and sciences are born from our vices: “Astronomy was born from superstition; eloquence from ambition, hate, flattery, and falsehood; geometry from avarice, physics from vain curiosity; all, even moral philosophy, from human pride.” (First Discourse, Vol. I, p. 12). The attack on sciences continues as Rousseau articulates how they fail to contribute anything positive to morality. They take time from the activities that are truly important, such as love of country, friends, and the unfortunate. Philosophical and scientific knowledge of subjects such as the relationship of the mind to the body, the orbit of the planets, and physical laws that govern particles fail to genuinely provide any guidance for making people more virtuous citizens. Rather, Rousseau argues that they create a false sense of need for luxury, so that science becomes simply a means for making our lives easier and more pleasurable, but not morally better.

The arts are the subject of similar attacks in the second part of the First Discourse. Artists, Rousseau says, wish first and foremost to be applauded. Their work comes from a sense of wanting to be praised as superior to others. Society begins to emphasize specialized talents rather than virtues such as courage, generosity, and temperance. This leads to yet another danger: the decline of military virtue, which is necessary for a society to defend itself against aggressors. And yet, after all of these attacks, the First Discourse ends with the praise of some very wise thinkers, among them, Bacon, Descartes, and Newton. These men were carried by their vast genius and were able to avoid corruption. However, Rousseau says, they are exceptions; and the great majority of people ought to focus their energies on improving their characters, rather than advancing the ideals of the Enlightenment in the arts and sciences.

b. Discourse on the Origin of Inequality

The Second Discourse, like the first, was a response to a question put forth by the academy of Dijon: “What is the origin of inequality among men; and is it authorized by the natural law?” Rousseau’s response to this question, the Discourse on the Origin of Inequality, is significantly different from the First Discourse for several reasons. First, in terms of the academy’s response, the Second Discourse was not nearly as well received. It exceeded the desired length, it was four times the length of the first, and made very bold philosophical claims; unlike the First Discourse, it did not win the prize. However, as Rousseau was now a well-known and respected author, he was able to have it published independently. Secondly, if the First Discourse is indicative of Rousseau as a “counter-Enlightenment” thinker, the Second Discourse, by contrast, can rightly be considered to be representative of Enlightenment thought. This is primarily because Rousseau, like Hobbes, attacks the classical notion of human beings as naturally social. Finally, in terms of its influence, the Second Discourse is now much more widely read, and is more representative of Rousseau’s general philosophical outlook. In the Confessions, Rousseau writes that he himself sees the Second Discourse as far superior to the first.

The Discourse on the Origin of Inequality is divided into four main parts: a dedication to the Republic of Geneva, a short preface, a first part, and a second part. The scope of Rousseau’s project is not significantly different from that of Hobbes in the Leviathan or Locke in the Second Treatise on Government. Like them, Rousseau understands society to be an invention, and he attempts to explain the nature of human beings by stripping them of all of the accidental qualities brought about by socialization. Thus, understanding human nature amounts to understanding what humans are like in a pure state of nature. This is in stark contrast to the classical view, most notably that of Aristotle, which claims that the state of civil society is the natural human state. Like Hobbes and Locke, however, it is doubtful that Rousseau meant his readers to understand the pure state of nature that he describes in the Second Discourse as a literal historical account. In its opening, he says that it must be denied that men were ever in the pure state of nature, citing revelation as a source which tells us that God directly endowed the first man with understanding (a capacity that he will later say is completely undeveloped in natural man). However, it seems in other parts of the Second Discourse that Rousseau is positing an actual historical account. Some of the stages in the progression from nature to civil society, Rousseau will argue, are empirically observable in so-called primitive tribes. And so the precise historicity with which one ought to regard Rousseau’s state of nature is the matter of some debate.

Part one is Rousseau’s description of human beings in the pure state of nature, uncorrupted by civilization and the socialization process. And although this way of examining human nature is consistent with other modern thinkers, Rousseau’s picture of “man in his natural state,” is radically different. Hobbes describes each human in the state of nature as being in a constant state of war against all others; hence life in the state of nature is solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short. But Rousseau argues that previous accounts such as Hobbes’ have all failed to actually depict humans in the true state of nature. Instead, they have taken civilized human beings and simply removed laws, government, and technology. For humans to be in a constant state of war with one another, they would need to have complex thought processes involving notions of property, calculations about the future, immediate recognition of all other humans as potential threats, and possibly even minimal language skills. These faculties, according to Rousseau, are not natural, but rather, they develop historically. In contrast to Hobbes, Rousseau describes natural man as isolated, timid, peaceful, mute, and without the foresight to worry about what the future will bring.

Purely natural human beings are fundamentally different from the egoistic Hobbesian view in another sense as well. Rousseau acknowledges that self-preservation is one principle of motivation for human actions, but unlike Hobbes, it is not the only principle. If it were, Rousseau claims that humans would be nothing more than monsters. Therefore, Rousseau concludes that self-preservation, or more generally self-interest, is only one of two principles of the human soul. The second principle is pity; it is “an innate repugnance to see his fellow suffer.” (Second Discourse, Vol. II, p. 36). It may seem that Rousseau’s depiction of natural human beings is one that makes them no different from other animals. However, Rousseau says that unlike all other creatures, humans are free agents. They have reason, although in the state of nature it is not yet developed. But it is this faculty that makes the long transition from the state of nature to the state of civilized society possible. He claims that if one examines any other species over the course of a thousand years, they will not have advanced significantly. Humans can develop when circumstances arise that trigger the use of reason.

Rousseau’s praise of humans in the state of nature is perhaps one of the most misunderstood ideas in his philosophy. Although the human being is naturally good and the “noble savage” is free from the vices that plague humans in civil society, Rousseau is not simply saying that humans in nature are good and humans in civil society are bad. Furthermore, he is not advocating a return to the state of nature, though some commentators, even his contemporaries such as Voltaire, have attributed such a view to him. Human beings in the state of nature are amoral creatures, neither virtuous nor vicious. After humans leave the state of nature, they can enjoy a higher form of goodness, moral goodness, which Rousseau articulates most explicitly in the Social Contract.

Having described the pure state of nature in the first part of the Second Discourse, Rousseau’s task in the second part is to explain the complex series of historical events that moved humans from this state to the state of present day civil society. Although they are not stated explicitly, Rousseau sees this development as occurring in a series of stages. From the pure state of nature, humans begin to organize into temporary groups for the purposes of specific tasks like hunting an animal. Very basic language in the form of grunts and gestures comes to be used in these groups. However, the groups last only as long as the task takes to be completed, and then they dissolve as quickly as they came together. The next stage involves more permanent social relationships including the traditional family, from which arises conjugal and paternal love. Basic conceptions of property and feelings of pride and competition develop in this stage as well. However, at this stage they are not developed to the point that they cause the pain and inequality that they do in present day society. If humans could have remained in this state, they would have been happy for the most part, primarily because the various tasks that they engaged in could all be done by each individual. The next stage in the historical development occurs when the arts of agriculture and metallurgy are discovered. Because these tasks required a division of labor, some people were better suited to certain types of physical labor, others to making tools, and still others to governing and organizing workers. Soon, there become distinct social classes and strict notions of property, creating conflict and ultimately a state of war not unlike the one that Hobbes describes. Those who have the most to lose call on the others to come together under a social contract for the protection of all. But Rousseau claims that the contract is specious, and that it was no more than a way for those in power to keep their power by convincing those with less that it was in their interest to accept the situation. And so, Rousseau says, “All ran to meet their chains thinking they secured their freedom, for although they had enough reason to feel the advantages of political establishment, they did not have enough experience to foresee its dangers.” (Second Discourse, Vol. II, p. 54).

The Discourse on the Origin of Inequality remains one of Rousseau’s most famous works, and lays the foundation for much of his political thought as it is expressed in the Discourse on Political Economy and Social Contract. Ultimately, the work is based on the idea that by nature, humans are essentially peaceful, content, and equal. It is the socialization process that has produced inequality, competition, and the egoistic mentality.

c. Discourse on Political Economy

The Discourse on Political Economy originally appeared in Diderot and d’Alembert’s Encyclopedia. In terms of its content the work seems to be, in many ways, a precursor to the Social Contract, which would appear in 1762. And whereas the Discourse on the Sciences and Arts and the Discourse on the Origin of Inequality look back on history and condemn what Rousseau sees as the lack of morality and justice in his own present day society, this work is much more constructive. That is, the Discourse on Political Economy explains what he takes to be a legitimate political regime.

The work is perhaps most significant because it is here that Rousseau introduces the concept of the “general will,” a major aspect of his political thought which is further developed in the Social Contract. There is debate among scholars about how exactly one ought to interpret this concept, but essentially, one can understand the general will in terms of an analogy. A political society is like a human body. A body is a unified entity though it has various parts that have particular functions. And just as the body has a will that looks after the well-being of the whole, a political state also has a will which looks to its general well-being. The major conflict in political philosophy occurs when the general will is at odds with one or more of the individual wills of its citizens.

With the conflict between the general and individual wills in mind, Rousseau articulates three maxims which supply the basis for a politically virtuous state: (1) Follow the general will in every action; (2) Ensure that every particular will is in accordance with the general will; and (3) Public needs must be satisfied. Citizens follow these maxims when there is a sense of equality among them, and when they develop a genuine respect for law. This again is in contrast to Hobbes, who says that laws are only followed when people fear punishment. That is, the state must make the penalty for breaking the law so severe that people do not see breaking the law to be of any advantage to them. Rousseau claims, instead, that when laws are in accordance with the general will, good citizens will respect and love both the state and their fellow citizens. Therefore, citizens will see the intrinsic value in the law, even in cases in which it may conflict with their individual wills.

4. The Social Contract

a. Background

The Social Contract is, like the Discourse on Political Economy, a work that is more philosophically constructive than either of the first two Discourses. Furthermore, the language used in the first and second Discourses is crafted in such a way as to make them appealing to the public, whereas the tone of the Social Contract is not nearly as eloquent and romantic. Another more obvious difference is that the Social Contract was not nearly as well-received; it was immediately banned by Paris authorities. And although the first two Discourses were, at the time of their publication, very popular, they are not philosophically systematic. The Social Contract, by contrast, is quite systematic and outlines how a government could exist in such a way that it protects the equality and character of its citizens. But although Rousseau’s project is different in scope in the Social Contract than it was in the first two Discourses, it would be a mistake to say that there is no philosophical connection between them. For the earlier works discuss the problems in civil society as well as the historical progression that has led to them. The Discourse on the Sciences and Arts claims that society has become such that no emphasis is put on the importance of virtue and morality. The Discourse on the Origin of Inequality traces the history of human beings from the pure state of nature through the institution of a specious social contract that results in present day civil society. The Social Contract does not deny any of these criticisms. In fact, chapter one begins with one of Rousseau’s most famous quotes, which echoes the claims of his earlier works: “Man was/is born free; and everywhere he is in chains.” (Social Contract, Vol. IV, p. 131). But unlike the first two Discourses, the Social Contract looks forward, and explores the potential for moving from the specious social contract to a legitimate one.

b. The General Will

The concept of the general will, first introduced in the Discourse on Political Economy, is further developed in the Social Contract although it remains ambiguous and difficult to interpret. The most pressing difficulty that arises is in the tension that seems to exist between liberalism and communitarianism. On one hand, Rousseau argues that following the general will allows for individual diversity and freedom. But at the same time, the general will also encourages the well-being of the whole, and therefore can conflict with the particular interests of individuals. This tension has led some to claim that Rousseau’s political thought is hopelessly inconsistent, although others have attempted to resolve the tension in order to find some type of middle ground between the two positions. Despite these difficulties, however, there are some aspects of the general will that Rousseau clearly articulates. First, the general will is directly tied to Sovereignty: but not Sovereignty merely in the sense of whomever holds power. Simply having power, for Rousseau, is not sufficient for that power to be morally legitimate. True Sovereignty is directed always at the public good, and the general will, therefore, speaks always infallibly to the benefit of the people. Second, the object of the general will is always abstract, or for lack of a better term, general. It can set up rules, social classes, or even a monarchial government, but it can never specify the particular individuals who are subject to the rules, members of the classes, or the rulers in the government. This is in keeping with the idea that the general will speaks to the good of the society as a whole. It is not to be confused with the collection of individual wills which would put their own needs, or the needs of particular factions, above those of the general public. This leads to a related point. Rousseau argues that there is an important distinction to be made between the general will and the collection of individual wills: “There is often a great deal of difference between the will of all and the general will. The latter looks only to the common interest; the former considers private interest and is only a sum of private wills. But take away from these same wills the pluses and minuses that cancel each other out, and the remaining sum of the differences is the general will.” (Social Contract, Vol. IV, p. 146). This point can be understood in an almost Rawlsian sense, namely that if the citizens were ignorant of the groups to which they would belong, they would inevitably make decisions that would be to the advantage of the society as a whole, and thus be in accordance with the general will.

c. Equality, Freedom, and Sovereignty

One problem that arises in Rousseau’s political theory is that the Social Contract purports to be a legitimate state in one sense because it frees human beings from their chains. But if the state is to protect individual freedom, how can this be reconciled with the notion of the general will, which looks always to the welfare of the whole and not to the will of the individual? This criticism, although not unfounded, is also not devastating. To answer it, one must return to the concepts of Sovereignty and the general will. True Sovereignty, again, is not simply the will of those in power, but rather the general will. Sovereignty does have the proper authority override the particular will of an individual or even the collective will of a particular group of individuals. However, as the general will is infallible, it can only do so when intervening will be to the benefit of the society. To understand this, one must take note of Rousseau’s emphasis on the equality and freedom of the citizens. Proper intervention on the part of the Sovereign is therefore best understood as that which secures the freedom and equality of citizens rather than that which limits them. Ultimately, the delicate balance between the supreme authority of the state and the rights of individual citizens is based on a social compact that protects society against factions and gross differences in wealth and privilege among its members.

5. The Emile

a. Background

The Emile or On Education is essentially a work that details Rousseau’s philosophy of education. It was originally published just several months after the Social Contract. Like the Social Contract, the Emile was immediately banned by Paris authorities, which prompted Rousseau to flee France. The major point of controversy in the Emile was not in his philosophy of education per se, however. Rather, it was the claims in one part of the book, the Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar in which Rousseau argues against traditional views of religion that led to the banning of the book. The Emile is unique in one sense because it is written as part novel and part philosophical treatise. Rousseau would use this same form in some of his later works as well. The book is written in first person, with the narrator as the tutor, and describes his education of a pupil, Emile, from birth to adulthood.

b. Education

The basic philosophy of education that Rousseau advocates in the Emile, much like his thought in the first two Discourses, is rooted in the notion that human beings are good by nature. The Emile is a large work, which is divided into five Books, and Book One opens with Rousseau’s claim that the goal of education should be to cultivate our natural tendencies. This is not to be confused with Rousseau’s praise of the pure state of nature in the Second Discourse. Rousseau is very clear that a return the state of nature once human beings have become civilized is not possible. Therefore, we should not seek to be noble savages in the literal sense, with no language, no social ties, and an underdeveloped faculty of reason. Rather, Rousseau says, someone who has been properly educated will be engaged in society, but relate to his or her fellow citizens in a natural way.

At first glance, this may seem paradoxical: If human beings are not social by nature, how can one properly speak of more or less natural ways of socializing with others? The best answer to this question requires an explanation of what Rousseau calls the two forms of self-love: amour-propre and amour de soi. Amour de soi is a natural form of self-love in that it does not depend on others. Rousseau claims that by our nature, each of us has this natural feeling of love toward ourselves. We naturally look after our own preservation and interests. By contrast, amour-propre is an unnatural self-love that is essentially relational. That is, it comes about in the ways in which human beings view themselves in comparison to other human beings. Without amour-propre, human beings would scarcely be able to move beyond the pure state of nature Rousseau describes in the Discourse on Inequality. Thus, amour-propre can contribute positively to human freedom and even virtue. Nevertheless, amour-propre is also extremely dangerous because it is so easily corruptible. Rousseau often describes the dangers of what commentators sometimes refer to as 'inflamed' amour-propre. In its corrupted form, amour-propre is the source of vice and misery, and results in human beings basing their own self worth on their feeling of superiority over others. While not developed in the pure state of nature, amour-propre is still a fundamental part of human nature. Therefore goal of Emile's natural education is in large part to keep him from falling into the corrupted form of this type of self-love.

Rousseau’s philosophy of education, therefore, is not geared simply at particular techniques that best ensure that the pupil will absorb information and concepts. It is better understood as a way of ensuring that the pupil’s character be developed in such a way as to have a healthy sense of self-worth and morality. This will allow the pupil to be virtuous even in the unnatural and imperfect society in which he lives. The character of Emile begins learning important moral lessons from his infancy, thorough childhood, and into early adulthood. His education relies on the tutor’s constant supervision. The tutor must even manipulate the environment in order to teach sometimes difficult moral lessons about humility, chastity, and honesty.

c. Women, Marriage, and Family

As Emile’s is a moral education, Rousseau discusses in great detail how the young pupil is to be brought up to regard women and sexuality. He introduces the character of Sophie, and explains how her education differs from Emile’s. Hers is not as focused on theoretical matters, as men’s minds are more suited to that type of thinking. Rousseau’s view on the nature of the relationship between men and women is rooted in the notion that men are stronger and therefore more independent. They depend on women only because they desire them. By contrast, women both need and desire men. Sophie is educated in such a way that she will fill what Rousseau takes to be her natural role as a wife. She is to be submissive to Emile. And although Rousseau advocates these very specific gender roles, it would be a mistake to take the view that Rousseau regards men as simply superior to women. Women have particular talents that men do not; Rousseau says that women are cleverer than men, and that they excel more in matters of practical reason. These views are continually discussed among both feminist and Rousseau scholars.

d. The Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar

The Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar is part of the fourth Book of the Emile. In his discussion of how to properly educate a pupil about religious matters, the tutor recounts a tale of an Italian who thirty years before was exiled from his town. Disillusioned, the young man was aided by a priest who explained his own views of religion, nature, and science. Rousseau then writes in the first person from the perspective of this young man, and recounts the Vicar’s speech.

The priest begins by explaining how, after a scandal in which he broke his vow of celibacy, he was arrested, suspended, and then dismissed. In his woeful state, the priest began to question all of his previously held ideas. Doubting everything, the priest attempts a Cartesian search for truth by doubting all things that he does not know with absolute certainty. But unlike Descartes, the Vicar is unable to come to any kind of clear and distinct ideas that could not be doubted. Instead, he follows what he calls the “Inner Light” which provides him with truths so intimate that he cannot help but accept them, even though they may be subject to philosophical difficulties. Among these truths, the Vicar finds that he exists as a free being with a free will which is distinct from his body that is not subject to physical, mechanical laws of motion. To the problem of how his immaterial will moves his physical body, the Vicar simply says “I cannot tell, but I perceive that it does so in myself; I will to do something and I do it; I will to move my body and it moves, but if an inanimate body, when at rest, should begin to move itself, the thing is incomprehensible and without precedent. The will is known to me in its action, not in its nature.” (Emile, p. 282). The discussion is particularly significant in that it marks the most comprehensive metaphysical account in Rousseau’s thought.

The Profession of Faith also includes the controversial discussion of natural religion, which was in large part the reason why Emile was banned. The controversy of this doctrine is the fact that it is categorically opposed to orthodox Christian views, specifically the claim that Christianity is the one true religion. The Vicar claims instead that knowledge of God is found in the observation of the natural order and one’s place in it. And so, any organized religion that correctly identifies God as the creator and preaches virtue and morality, is true in this sense. Therefore, the Vicar concludes, each citizen should dutifully practice the religion of his or her own country so long as it is in line with the religion, and thus morality, of nature.

6. Other Works

a. Julie or the New Heloise

Julie or the New Heloise remains one of Rousseau’s popular works, though it is not a philosophical treatise, but rather a novel. The work tells the story of Julie d'Etange and St. Preux, who were one time lovers. Later, at the invitation of her husband, St. Preux unexpectedly comes back into Julie’s life. Although not a work of philosophy per se, Julie or the New Heloise is still unmistakably Rousseau’s. The major tenets of his thought are clearly evident; the struggle of the individual against societal norms, emotions versus reason, and the goodness of human nature are all prevalent themes.

b. Reveries of the Solitary Walker

Rousseau began writing the Reveries of the Solitary Walker in the fall of 1776. By this time, he had grown increasingly distressed over the condemnation of several of his works, most notably the Emile and the Social Contract. This public rejection, combined with rifts in his personal relationships, left him feeling betrayed and even as though he was the victim of a great conspiracy. The work is divided into ten “walks” in which Rousseau reflects on his life, what he sees as his contribution to the public good, and how he and his work have been misunderstood. It is interesting that Rousseau returns to nature, which he had always praised throughout his career. One also recognizes in this praise the recognition of God as the just creator of nature, a theme so prevalent in the Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar. The Reveries of the Solitary Walker, like many of Rousseau’s other works, is part story and part philosophical treatise. The reader sees in it, not only philosophy, but also the reflections of the philosopher himself.

c. Rousseau: Judge of Jean Jacques

The most distinctive feature of this late work, often referred to simply as the Dialogues, is that it is written in the form of three dialogues. The characters in the dialogues are “Rousseau” and an interlocutor identified simply as a “Frenchman.” The subject of these characters’ conversations is the author “Jean-Jacques,” who is the actual historical Rousseau. This somewhat confusing arrangement serves the purpose of Rousseau judging his own career. The character “Rousseau,” therefore, represents Rousseau had he not written his collected works but instead had discovered them as if they were written by someone else. What would he think of this author, represented in the Dialogues as the character “Jean-Jacques?” This self-examination makes two major claims. First, like the Reveries, it makes clearly evident the fact that Rousseau felt victimized and betrayed, and shows perhaps even more so than the Reveries, Rousseau’s growing paranoia. And second, the Dialogues represent one of the few places that Rousseau claims his work is systematic. He claims that there is a philosophical consistency that runs throughout his works. Whether one accepts that such a system is present in Rousseau’s philosophy or not is a question that was not only debated during Rousseau’s time, but is also continually discussed among contemporary scholars.

7. Historical and Philosophical Influence

It is difficult to overestimate Rousseau’s influence, both in the Western philosophical tradition, and historically. Perhaps his greatest directly philosophical influence is on the ethical thought of Immanuel Kant. This may seem puzzling at first glance. For Kant, the moral law is based on rationality, whereas in Rousseau, there is a constant theme of nature and even the emotional faculty of pity described in the Second Discourse. This theme in Rousseau’s thought is not to be ignored, and it would be a mistake to understand Rousseau’s ethics merely as a precursor to Kant; certainly Rousseau is unique and significant in his own respect. But despite these differences, the influence on Kant is undeniable. The Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar is one text in particular that illustrates this influence. The Vicar claims that the correct view of the universe is to see oneself not at the center of things, but rather on the circumference, with all people realizing that we have a common center. This same notion is expressed in the Rousseau’s political theory, particularly in the concept of the general will. In Kant’s ethics, one of the major themes is the claim that moral actions are those that can be universalized. Morality is something separate from individual happiness: a view that Rousseau undoubtedly expresses as well.

A second major influence is Rousseau’s political thought. Not only is he one of the most important figures in the history of political philosophy, later influencing Karl Marx among others, but his works were also championed by the leaders of the French Revolution. And finally, his philosophy was largely instrumental in the late eighteenth century Romantic Naturalism movement in Europe thanks in large part to Julie or the New Heloise and the Reveries of the Solitary Walker.

Contemporary Rousseau scholarship continues to discuss many of the same issues that were debated in the eighteenth century. The tension in his political thought between individual liberty and totalitarianism continues to be an issue of controversy among scholars. Another aspect of Rousseau’s philosophy that has proven to be influential is his view of the family, particularly as it pertains to the roles of men and women.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Rousseau

Below is a list of Rousseau’s major works in chronological order. The titles are given in the original French as well as the English translation. Following the title is the year of the work’s first publication and, for some works, a brief description:

  • Discours sur les Sciences et les Arts (Discourse on the Sciences and Arts), 1750.
    • Often referred to as the “First Discourse,” this work was a submission to the Academy of Dijon’s essay contest, which it won, on the question, “Has the restoration of the sciences and arts tended to purify morals?”
  • Le Devin du Village (The Village Soothsayer), 1753.
    • Rousseau’s opera: it was performed in France and widely successful.
  • Narcisse ou l’amant de lui-même (Narcissus or the lover of himself), 1753.
    • A play written by Rousseau.
  • Lettre sur la musique francaise (Letter on French music), 1753.
  • Discours sur l’origine et les fondments de l’inegalite (Discourse on the Origin and Foundations of Inequality), 1755.
    • Often referred to as the “Second Discourse,” this was another submission to an essay contest sponsored by the Academy of Dijon, though unlike the First Discourse, it did not win the prize. The Second Discourse is a response to the question, “What is the Origin of Inequality Among Men and is it Authorized by the Natural Law?”
  • Discours sur l’Économie politique (Discourse on Political Economy), 1755.
    • Sometimes called the “Third Discourse,” this work originally appeared in the Encyclopédie of Diderot and d’Alembert.
  • Lettre á d’Alembert sur les Spectacles (Letter to Alembert on the Theater), 1758.
  • Juli ou la Nouvelle Héloïse (Julie or the New Heloise), 1761.
    • A novel that was widely read and successful immediately after its publication.
  • Du Contract Social (The Social Contract), 1762.
    • Rousseau’s most comprehensive work on politics.
  • Émile ou de l’Éducation (Émile or On Education), 1762.
    • Rousseau’s major work on education. It also contains the Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar, which documents Rousseau’s views on metaphysics, free will, and his controversial views on natural religion for which the work was banned by Parisian authorities.
  • Lettre á Christophe de Beaumont, Archévêque de Paris (Letter to Christopher de Beaumont, Archbishop of Paris), 1763.
  • Lettres écrites de la Montagne (Letters Written from the Mountain), 1764.
  • Dictionnaire de Musique (Dictionary of Music), 1767.
  • Émile et Sophie ou les Solitaires (Émile and Sophie or the Solitaries), 1780.
    • A short sequel to the Émile.
  • Considérations sur le gouverment de la Pologne (Considerations on the Government of Poland), 1782.
  • Les Confessions (The Confessions), Part I 1782, Part II 1789.
    • Rousseau’s autobiography.
  • Rousseau juge de Jean-Jacques, Dialogues (Rousseau judge of Jean-Jacques, Dialogues), First Dialogue 1780, Complete 1782.
  • Les Rêveries du Promeneur Solitaire (Reveries of the Solitary Walker), 1782.

b. Works about Rousseau

The standard original language edition is Ouevres completes de Jean Jacques Rousseau, eds. Bernard Gagnebin and Marcel Raymond, Paris: Gallimard, 1959-1995. The most comprehensive English translation of Rousseau’s works is the Collected Writings of Rousseau, series eds. Roger Masters and Christopher Kelly, Hanover: University Press of New England, 1990-1997. References are given by the title of the work, the volume number (in Roman Numerals), and the page number. The Collected Works do not include the Emile. References to this work are from Emile, trans. Barbara Foxley, London: Everyman, 2000. The following is a brief list of widely available secondary texts.

  • Cooper, Laurence D. Rousseau and Nature: The Problem of the Good Life. Penn State UP, 1999. Cranston, Maurice. Jean-Jacques: The Early Life and Work of Jean-Jacques, 1712- 1754. University of Chicago Press, 1991.
  • Cranston, Maurice. The Noble Savage: Jean-Jacques Rousseau, 1754-1762. University of Chicago Press, 1991.
  • Cranston, Maurice. The Solitary Self: Jean-Jacques Rousseau in Exile and Adversity. University of Chicago Press, 1997.
  • Dent, N.J.H. Rousseau. Blackwell, 1988.
  • Gourevitch, Victor. Rousseau: The ‘Discourses’ and Other Early Political Writings. Cambridge UP, 1997.
  • Gourevitch, Victor. Rousseau: The ‘Social Contract’ and Other Later Political Writings. Cambridge UP, 1997.
  • Melzer, Arthur. The Natural Goodness of Man: On the Systems of Rousseau's Thought. University of Chicago Press, 1990.
  • Neuhouser, Frederick. Rousseau's Theodicy of Self-Love: Evil, Rationality, and the Drive for Recognition. Oxford University Press, 2008.

  • O’Hagan, Timothy. Rousseau. Routledge, 1999.
  • Riley, Patrick, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Rousseau. Cambridge UP, 2001.
  • Reisert, Joseph. Jean-Jacques Rousseau: A Friend of Virtue. Cornell UP, 2003.
  • Rosenblatt, Helena. Rousseau and Geneva. Cambridge: Cabridge UP, 1997.
  • Starobinski, Jean. Jean-Jacques Rousseau: Transparency and Obstruction. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988.
  • Wokler, Robert. Rousseau. Oxford: Oxford UP, 1995.
  • Wokler, Robert, ed. Rousseau and Liberty. Manchester: Manchester UP, 1995.

Author Information

James J. Delaney
Niagara University
U. S. A.

George Berkeley (1685—1753)


George Berkeley was one of the three most famous British Empiricists. (The other two are John Locke and David Hume.)  Berkeley is best known for his early works on vision (An Essay towards a New Theory of Vision, 1709) and metaphysics (A Treatise concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, 1710; Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous, 1713).

Berkeley’s empirical theory of vision challenged the then-standard account of distance vision, an account which requires tacit geometrical calculations.  His alternative account focuses on visual and tactual objects.  Berkeley argues that the visual perception of distance is explained by the correlation of ideas of sight and touch.  This associative approach does away with appeals to geometrical calculation while explaining monocular vision and the moon illusion, anomalies that had plagued the geometric account.

Berkeley claimed that abstract ideas are the source of all philosophical perplexity and illusion.  In his Introduction to the Principles of Human Knowledge he argued that, as Locke described abstract ideas (Berkeley considered Locke’s the best account of abstraction), (1) they cannot, in fact, be formed, (2) they are not needed for communication or knowledge, and (3) they are inconsistent and therefore inconceivable.

In the Principles and the Three Dialogues Berkeley defends two metaphysical theses:  idealism (the claim that everything that exists either is a mind or depends on a mind for its existence) and immaterialism (the claim that matter does not exist).  His contention that all physical objects are composed of ideas is encapsulated in his motto esse is percipi (to be is to be perceived).

Although Berkeley’s early works were idealistic, he says little in them regarding the nature of one’s knowledge of the mind.  Much of what can be gleaned regarding Berkeley’s account of mind is derived from the remarks on “notions” that were added to the 1734 editions of the Principles and the Three Dialogues.

Berkeley was a priest of the Church of Ireland.  In the 1720s, his religious interests came to the fore.  He was named Dean of Derry in 1724.  He attempted to found a college in Bermuda, spending several years in Rhode Island waiting for the British government to provide the funding it had promised.  When it became clear that the funding would not be provided, he returned to London.  There he published Alciphron (a defense of Christianity), criticisms of Newton’s theory of infinitesimals, The Theory of Vision Vindicated, and revised editions of the Principles, and the Three Dialogues.  He was named Bishop of Cloyne in 1734 and lived in Cloyne until his retirement in 1752.  He was a good bishop, seeking the welfare of Protestants and Catholics alike.  His Querist (1735-1737) presents arguments for the reform of the Irish economy.  His last philosophical work, Siris (1744), includes a discussion of the medicinal virtues of tar water, followed by properly philosophical discussions that many scholars see as a departure from his earlier idealism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Essays on Vision
  3. Against Abstraction
  4. Idealism and Immaterialism
  5. Notions
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

George Berkeley was born in or near Kilkenny, Ireland on 12 March 1685. He was raised in Dysart Castle. Although his father was English, Berkeley always considered himself Irish. In 1696, he entered Kilkenny College. He entered Trinity College, Dublin on 21 March 1700 and received his B.A. in 1704. He remained associated with Trinity College until 1724. In 1706 he competed for a College Fellowship which had become available and became a Junior Fellow on 9 June 1707. After completing his doctorate, he became a Senior Fellow in 1717. As was common practice for British academics at the time, Berkeley was ordained as an Anglican priest in 1710.

The works for which Berkeley is best known were written during his Trinity College period. In 1709, he published An Essay towards a New Theory of Vision. In 1710, he published A Treatise concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, Part I. In 1712, he published Passive Obedience, which focuses on moral and political philosophy. In 1713, he published Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous. In 1721, he published De Motu. In addition, there is a set of notebooks, often called the Philosophical Commentaries (PC), that covers the period during which he developed his idealism and immaterialism. These were personal notebooks, and he never intended to publish them.

While Berkeley was associated with Trinity College until 1724, he was not continuously in residence. In 1713, he left for London, in part to arrange publication for the Three Dialogues. He befriended some of the intellectual lights of the time, including Jonathan Swift, Joseph Addison, Richard Steele, and Alexander Pope. He contributed several articles against free-thinking (agnosticism) to Steele's Guardian. Since the articles were unsigned, disagreement remains regarding which articles Berkeley wrote. He was the chaplain to Lord Peterborough during his 1713-1714 continental tour. There is some evidence that Berkeley met the French philosopher Nicholas Malebranche during that tour, although the popular myth that their conversation occasioned Malebranche's death is false: Malebranche died in 1715. He was the chaperone of young St. George Ashe, son of the Trinity College provost, during his continental tour from 1716-21. It was during this tour that Berkeley later claimed to have lost the manuscript to the second part of the Principles (Works 2:282). He observed the eruption of Mount Vesuvius in 1717 and sent a description of it to the Royal Society (Works 4:247-250). While in Lyon, France in 1720, Berkeley wrote De Motu, an essay on motion which reflects his scientific instrumentalism. The manuscript was Berkeley's entry for a dissertation prize sponsored by the French Academy. It did not win.

In May 1724, Berkeley became Anglican Dean of Derry and resigned his position at Trinity College. He was never a dean in residence. Between 1722 and 1728, Berkeley developed a plan to establish a seminary in Bermuda for the sons of colonists and Native Americans. He actively lobbied for his project. He obtained a charter for the college, private contributions, and a promise for a grant of £20,000 from the British Parliament. After marrying Anne Foster on August 1, 1728, he and his bride departed for America in September 1728. He settled near Newport, Rhode Island, waiting for the promised grant. He bought a farm and built a house named Whitehall, which is still standing. He was an active cleric during his stay in Rhode Island. He was in contact with some of the leading American intellectuals of the time, including Samuel Johnson, who became the first president of King's College (now Columbia University). He wrote the bulk of Alciphron, his defense of Christianity against free-thinking, while in America. In early 1731, Edmund Gibson, the Bishop of London, informed Berkeley that Sir Robert Walpole had informed him that there was little likelihood that the promised grant would be paid. Berkeley returned to London in October 1731. Before leaving America he divided his library between the Harvard and Yale libraries, and he gave his farm to Yale.

After his return to London, Berkeley published A Sermon before the Society for the Propagation of the Gospel in Foreign Parts (1732), Alciphron: or the Minute Philosopher (1732), The Theory of Vision, or Visual Language shewing the immediate Presence and Providence of A Deity, Vindicated and Explained (1733), The Analyst; or, a Discourse Addressed to an Infidel Mathematician (1734), A Defense of Free-Thinking in Mathematics (1735), Reasons for not Replying to Mr Walton's Full Answer (1735), as well as revised editions of the Principles and the Dialogues (1734). The revisions of the Principles and Dialogues contain Berkeley's scant remarks on the nature and one’s knowledge of mind (notions).

While the Bermuda Project was a practical failure, it increased Berkeley's reputation as a religious leader. It is considered partially responsible for his appointment as Bishop of Cloyne in January 1734. In February 1734 he resigned as Dean of Derry. He was consecrated Bishop of Cloyne in St. Paul's Church, Dublin, on 19 May 1734.

Berkeley was a good bishop. As bishop of an economically poor Anglican diocese in a predominantly Roman Catholic country, he was committed to the well-being of both Protestants and Catholics. He established a school to teach spinning, and he attempted to establish the manufacture of linen. His Querist (1735-1737) concerns economic and social issues germane to Ireland. Among other things, it contains a proposal for monetary reform. His Siris (1744) prefaces his philosophical discussions with an account of the medicinal value of tar water. The relationship of Siris to his early philosophy continues to be a matter of scholarly discussion.

Except for a trip to Dublin in 1737 to address the Irish House of Lords and a trip to Kilkenny in 1750 to visit family, he was continually in Cloyne until his retirement. In August 1752, Berkeley and his family left Cloyne for Oxford, ostensibly to oversee the education of his son George. While at Oxford, he arranged for the republication of his Alciphron and the publication of his Miscellany, a collection of essays on various subjects. He died on January 14, 1753 while his wife was reading him a sermon. In keeping with his will, his body was "kept five days above ground, ... even till it grow offensive by the cadaverous smell" (Works 8:381), a provision that was intended to prevent premature burial. (This was the age in which some caskets were fitted with bells above ground so the "dead" could “ring up” if their beneficiaries had been a bit hasty.)

2. Essays on Vision

In 1709, Berkeley published An Essay towards a New Theory of Vision (NTV). This is an empirical account of the perception of distance, magnitude, and figure. The New Theory of Vision does not presuppose immaterialism, and, although Berkeley held that it was connected with his later works, the degree of connection is hotly contested among scholars. Berkeley also discusses vision in Dialogue 4 of Alciphron (1732), and, in reply to a set of objections, in the Theory of Vision …Vindicated (TVV). He alludes to his account of vision in the Principles of Human Knowledge (PHK §§42-44) and the Three Dialogues (DHP1 201-203).

Berkeley's objective in the New Theory of Vision was "to shew the manner wherein we perceive by sight the distance, magnitude, and situation of objects. Also to consider the difference there is betwixt the ideas of sight and touch, and whether there be any idea common to both senses" (NTV §1). Berkeley agrees with other writers on optics that distance is not immediately seen (NTV §2) and recounts the positions of earlier writers. Some held that we correlate our current perceptions with earlier perceptions and judge that the objects are distant because we had experienced the large size of intermediate objects, or because the objects which now appear small and faint had earlier appeared large and vigorous (NTV §3). Some, such as Descartes, held that distance is judged by a natural geometry based on the angles between the perceived object and the eyes or on the angles of the rays of light that fall upon the eye (NTV §§4 and 6, and Works 1:237-238; Descartes 1:170). Berkeley rejects those accounts.

When one perceives mediately, one perceives one idea by means of perceiving another (NTV §9), for example, one perceives that someone is frightened by perceiving the paleness of her face (NTV §10). Empirically, the geometrical account fails, since one perceives neither the requisite lines, nor angles, nor rays as such (NTV §§12-15), even though such mathematical computations can be useful in determining the apparent distance or magnitude of an object (NTV §§ 38, 78; TVV §58). So, what are the immediate ideas that mediate the perception of distance? First, there are the kinesthetic sensations associated with focusing the eyes when perceiving objects at various distances (NTV §16). Second, as objects are brought closer to the eye, their appearance becomes more confused (blurred or double, NTV §21). Third, as an object approaches the eyes, the degree of confusion can be mitigated by straining the eyes, which is recognized by kinesthetic sensations (NTV §27). In each case, there is no necessary connection between the ideas and distance; there is merely a customary connection between two types of ideas (NTV §§17, 26, 28). A necessary connection is a relation such as that found among numbers in true arithmetic equations. It is impossible for 7+3 to equal anything other than 10, and it is impossible to imagine it to be anything other than 10. A customary connection is a relation found in experience in which one type of idea is found with or followed by another, but which one could imagine the situation to be otherwise. David Hume's famous example is that experience shows that whenever one billiard ball hits another, the second rolls away, but the fact that one could imagine anything happening shows that there is merely a customary connection between the actions of the billiard balls. It is in this sense that ideas of touch and sight are merely customarily, and not necessarily, connected. The absence of a necessary connection between these ideas is further illustrated by the fact that nearsighted (purblind) persons find that objects appear less, rather than more, confused as they approach to the eyes (NTV §37). Since one perceives distance by sight mediately through the correlation of visual ideas with nonvisual ideas, a person born blind and who came to see would have no notion of visual distance: even the most remote objects would "seem to be in his eye, or rather his mind (NTV §41) This is Berkeley's first allusion to Molyneux's man-born-blind-made-to-see (cf. Locke 2.9.8, pp. 145-146), which Berkeley regularly uses to show the consequences of his theory of vision (see also NTV §§79, 110, and 132-133; TVV §71). Molyneux's contention was that if a person were born blind and had learned to distinguish a cube from a sphere by touch, he would not immediately be able to distinguish a visual cube from a sphere if he were given sight.

Like most philosophers of the period, Berkeley seems to assume that touch provides immediate access to the world. Visual ideas of an object, on the other hand, vary with one's distance from the object. As one approaches a tower one judges to be about a mile away, "the appearance alters, and from being obscure, small, and faint, grows clear, large, and vigorous" (NTV §44). The tower is taken to be of a determinate size and shape, but the visual appearance continually changes. How can that be? Berkeley claims that visual ideas are merely signs of tactile ideas. There is no resemblance between visual and tactile ideas. Their relationship is like that between words and their meanings. If one hears a noun, one thinks of an object it denotes. Similarly, if one sees an object, one thinks of a corresponding idea of touch, which Berkeley deems the secondary (mediate) object of sight. In both cases, there are no necessary connections between the ideas. The associative connection is based on experience (NTV §51; cf. TVV §40, Alciphron, Dialogue 4).

His discussion of magnitude is analogous to his discussion of distance. Berkeley explores the relationships between the objects of sight and touch by introducing the notions of minimum visibles and tangibles, the smallest points one actually can perceive by sight and touch, points which must be taken to be indivisible. The apparent size of a visible object varies with distance, while the size of the corresponding tangible object is taken to be constant (NTV §55). The apparent size of the visual object, its confusion or distinctness, and its faintness or vigor play roles in judging the size of the tangible object. All things being equal, if it appears large, it is taken to be large. "But, be the idea immediately perceived by sight never so large, yet if it be withal confused, I judge the magnitude of the thing to be but small. If it be distinct and clear, I judge it greater. And if it be faint, I apprehend it to be yet greater" (NTV §56; see also §57). As in the case of distance, there are no necessary connections between the sensory elements of the visual and tangible object. The correlations are only known by consistent experience (NTV §§59, 62-64), and Berkeley argues that measurements (inches, feet, etc.) are applicable only to tangible size (NTV §61).

The arguments are repeated, mutates mutandis, regarding visual and tangible figure (NTV §§105ff).

Berkeley argues that the objects of sight and touch - indeed, the objects of each sensible modalities – are distinct and incommensurable. This is known as the heterogeneity thesis (see NTV §§108ff). The tower that visually appears to be small and round from a distance is perceived to be large and square by touch. So, one complex tactual object corresponds to the indefinitely large number of visual objects. Since there are no necessary connections between the objects of sight and touch, the objects must be distinct. Further, his discussion of "hearing the coach approach" shows that there is a similar distinction between the objects of hearing and touch (NTV §46). Given the hypothesis that the number of minimum visibles seen is constant and the same among individual humans and other creatures (NTV §§80-81), it follows that the objects seen when using a microscope are not the same as those seen by the naked eye (NTV §85; cf. NTV §105 and DHP3 245-246).

Before turning to the discussions of Berkeley's idealism and immaterialism, there are several points we should notice. First, there are various points in the New Theory of Vision where Berkeley writes as if ideas of touch are or are of external objects (cf. §§ 46, 64, 77, 78, 82, 88, 99, 117, 155). Since the Berkeley of the Principles and Dialogues contends that all ideas are mind-dependent and all physical objects are composed of ideas, some have questioned whether the position in the New Theory of Vision is consistent with the work that immediately follows. Some scholars suggest that either that the works on vision are scientific works which, as such, make no metaphysical commitments or that allusions to "external objects" are cases of speaking with the vulgar. Secondly, insofar as in his later works Berkeley claims that ordinary objects are composed of ideas, his discussion of the correlation of ideas of sight and touch tends to anticipate his later view by explaining how one "collects" the ideas of distinct senses to form one thing. Finally, the New Theory of Vision includes discussions of the primary/secondary qualities distinction (§§43, 48-49, 61, 109) and of abstraction (NTV §§122-127) that anticipate his later discussions of those topics.

3. Against Abstraction

In the Introduction to the Principles of Human Knowledge, Berkeley laments the doubt and uncertainty found in philosophical discussions (Intro. §§1-3), and he attempts to find those principles that drew philosophy away from common sense and intuition (PHK §4). He finds the source of skepticism in the theory of abstract ideas, which he criticizes.

Berkeley begins by giving a general overview of the doctrine:

It is agreed on all hands, that the qualities or modes of things do never really exist each of them apart by it self, and separated from all others, but are mixed, as it were, and blended together, several in the same object. But we are told, the mind being able to consider each quality singly, or abstracted from those other qualities with which it is united, does by that means frame to it self abstract ideas. … Not that it is possible for colour or motion to exist without extension: but only that the mind can frame to it self by abstraction the idea of colour exclusive of extension, and of motion exclusive of both colour and extension. (Intro, §7)

In §§8-9 he details the doctrine in terms of Locke's account in the Essay concerning Human Understanding. Although theories of abstraction date back at least to Aristotle (Metaphysics, Book K, Chapter 3, 1061a29-1069b4), were prevalent among the medievals (cf. Intro, §17 and PC §779), and are found in the Cartesians (Descartes, 1:212-213; Arnauld and Nicole, pp. 37-38), there seem to be two reasons why Berkeley focused on Locke. First, Locke's work was recent and familiar. Second, Berkeley seems to have considered Locke's account the best available. As he wrote in his notebooks, "Wonderful in Locke that he could wn advanc'd in years see at all thro a mist yt had been so long a gathering & was consequently thick. This more to be admir'd than yt he didn't see farther" (PC §567).

According to Locke, the doctrine of abstract ideas explains how knowledge can be communicated and how it can be increased. It explains how general terms obtain meaning (Locke, 3.3.1-20, pp. 409-420). A general term, such as 'cat' refers to an abstract general idea, which contains all and only those properties that one deems common to all cats, or, more properly, the ways in which all cats resemble each other. The connection between a general term and an abstract idea is arbitrary and conventional, and the relation between an abstract idea and the individual objects falling under it is a natural relation (resemblance). If Locke's theory is sound, it provides a means by which one can account for the meaning of general terms without invoking general objects (universals).

Berkeley's attack on the doctrine of abstract ideas follows three tracks. (1) There is the "I can’t do it" argument in Intro. §10. (2) There is the "We don't need it" argument in Intro. §§11-12. And (3) there is the “The theory leads to inconsistencies" argument in Intro. §13, which Berkeley deemed the "killing blow” (PC §687). As we shall see, Berkeley uses a similar tripartite attack on doctrine of material substance (see PHK §§16-23).

Having outlined Locke's account of abstraction in Introduction §§8-9, which allegedly results in the idea of a human which is colored but has no determinate color - that the idea includes a general idea of color, but not a specific color such as black or white or brown or yellow - which has a size but has no determinate size, and so forth, Berkeley argues in §10 that he can form no such idea. On the face of it, his argument is weak. At most it shows that insofar as he cannot form the idea, and assuming that all humans have similar psychological abilities, there is some evidence that no humans can form abstract ideas of the sort Locke described.

But there is a remark made in passing that suggests there is a much stronger argument implicit in the section. Berkeley writes:

To be plain, I own my self able to abstract in one sense, as when I consider some particular parts or qualities separated from others, with which though they are united in some object, yet, it is possible they may really exist without them. But I deny that I can abstract one from another, or conceive separately, those qualities which it is impossible should exist so separated; or that I can frame a general notion by abstracting from particulars in the manner aforesaid. Which two last are the proper acceptations of abstraction. (Intro. §10)

This three-fold distinction among types of abstraction is found in Arnauld and Nicole's Logic or the Art of Thinking. The first type of abstraction concerns integral parts. The head, arms, torso, and legs are integral parts of a body: each can exist in separation from the body of which it is a part (Arnauld and Nicole, p. 37). The second kind of abstraction "arises when we consider a mode without paying attention to its substance, or two modes which are joined together in the same substance, taking each one separately" (Arnauld and Nicole, p. 37). The third concerns distinctions of reason, for example, conceiving of a triangle as equilateral without conceiving of it as equiangular (Arnauld and Nicole, p. 38). Berkeley grants that he can abstract in the first sense - "I can consider the hand, the eye, the nose, each by it self abstracted or separated from the rest of the body" (Intro. §10) - but he denies that he can abstract in the latter two senses. The latter two cases represent impossible states of affairs. In §7 Berkeley noted that the abstractionists held that it is impossible for a mode to exist apart from a substance. Many abstractionists also accepted a conceivability criterion of possibility: If one can (clearly and distinctly) conceive of a state of affairs, then it is possible for that state of affairs to exist as conceived (cf. Descartes, 2:54). This principle entails that impossible states of affairs are inconceivable. So, granting it is impossible for a mode to exist apart from a substance (Intro. §7), it follows that it is impossible to conceive of a mode apart from a substance, that the second form abstraction is impossible. And if the second falls, the third falls as well, since the third requires that alternative descriptions of an object pick out no differences in reality. So, a traditional theory of modes and substances, the conceivability criterion of possibility, and abstraction are an inconsistent triad. The inconsistency can be resolved by dropping the doctrine of abstract ideas. Berkeley made this point explicitly in the first draft of the Introduction:

It is, I think, a receiv'd axiom that an impossibility cannot be conceiv'd. For what created intelligence will pretend to conceive, that which God cannot cause to be? Now it is on all hands agreed, that nothing abstract or general can be made really to exist, whence it should seem to follow, that it cannot have so much as an ideal existence in the understanding. (Works 2:125)

One of the marks of the modern period is an adherence to the principle of parsimony (Ockham's Razor). The principle holds that the theoretically simpler of two explanations is more probably true. In the seventeenth and eighteen centuries, this was sometimes expressed as "God does nothing in vain" (cf. DHP2 214). So, if it is possible to construct a theory of meaning that does not introduce abstract ideas as a distinct kind of idea, that theory would be simpler and deemed more probably true. This is the strategy Berkeley adopts in Introduction §§11-12.

Granting Locke that all existents are particulars (Locke 3.3.6, p. 410), Berkeley remarks, "But it seems that a word becomes general by being made the sign, not of an abstract general idea but, of several particular ideas, any one of which it indifferently suggests to the mind" (Intro. §11). Ideas remain particular, although a particular idea can function as a general idea. For example, when a geometer draws a line on a blackboard, it is taken to represent all lines, even though the line itself is particular and has determinate qualities. Similarly, a particular idea can represent all similar ideas. So, whether one takes Berkeley to mean that words apply immediately to objects or that meaning is mediated by paradigmatic ideas, the theory is simpler than the abstractionists' insofar as all ideas are particular and determinate.

In Introduction §13, Berkeley turns to Locke's abstract general idea of a triangle, an idea which "must be neither oblique nor rectangle, neither equilateral, equicrural, nor scalenon, but all and none of these at once. In effect, it is something imperfect that cannot exist, an idea wherein some parts of several different and inconsistent ideas are put together" (Locke 4.7.9, p. 596; quoted in Intro. §13, Berkeley's emphasis). Upon quoting the passage, Berkeley merely asks his reader whether he or she can form the idea, but his point seems to be much stronger. The described idea is inconsistent, and therefore represents an impossible state of affairs, and it is therefore inconceivable, since whatever is impossible is inconceivable. This is explicit in a parallel passage in the New Theory of Vision. After quoting the triangle passage, Berkeley remarks, "But had he called to mind what he says in another place, to wit, 'That ideas of mixed modes wherein any inconsistent ideas are put together cannot so much as exist in the mind, i.e. be conceived.' vid. B. iii. C. 10. S. 33. ibid. I say, had this occurred to his thoughts, it is not improbable he would have owned it above all the pains and skill he was master of, to form the above-mentioned idea of a triangle, which is made up of manifest, staring contradictions" (NTV §125).

If abstract ideas are not needed for communication - Berkeley takes the fact that infants and poorly educated people communicate, while the formation of abstract ideas is said to be difficult, as a basis for doubting the difficulty thesis (Intro. §14) - he is able to give short shrift to the contention that abstract ideas are necessary for knowledge. The abstractionists maintain that abstract ideas are needed for geometrical proofs. Berkeley argues that only properties concerning, for example, a triangle as such are germane to a geometric proof. So, even if one's idea of a triangle is wholly determinate (consider a diagram on a blackboard), none of the differentiating properties prevent one from constructing a proof, since a proof is not concerned solely with the idea (or drawing) with which one begins. He maintains that it is consistent with his theory of meaning to selectively attend to a single aspect of a complex, determinate idea (Intro. §16).

Berkeley concludes his discussion of abstraction by noting that not all general words are used to denote objects or kinds of objects. His discussion of the nondenotative uses of language is often taken to anticipate Ludwig Wittgenstein's interest in meaning-as-use.

4. Idealism and Immaterialism

Berkeley's famous principle is esse is percipi, to be is to be perceived. Berkeley was an idealist. He held that ordinary objects are only collections of ideas, which are mind-dependent. Berkeley was an immaterialist. He held that there are no material substances. There are only finite mental substances and an infinite mental substance, namely, God. On these points there is general agreement. There is less agreement on Berkeley's argumentative approach to idealism and immaterialism and on the role of some of his specific arguments. His central arguments are often deemed weak.

The account developed here is based primarily on the opening thirty-three sections of the Principles of Human Knowledge. It assumes, contrary to some commentators, that Berkeley's metaphysics rests on epistemological foundations. This approach is prima facie plausible insofar as it explains the appeal to knowledge in the title of the Principles (cf. Intro. §4), it is consistent with Berkeley's epistemic concerns in other writings (cf. TVV §18), and it provides an explanatory role for abstract ideas. There will be occasional digressions concerning the problems perceived by those who claim that Berkeley's approach was more straightforwardly metaphysical.

Berkeley begins his discussion as follows:

It is evident to any one who takes a survey of the objects of human knowledge, that they are either ideas actually imprinted on the senses, or else such as are perceived by attending to the passions and operations of the mind, or lastly ideas formed by help of memory and imagination, either compounding, dividing, or barely representing those originally perceived in the aforesaid ways. (PHK §1).

This seems to say that ideas are the immediate objects of knowledge in a fundamental sense (acquaintance). Following Locke, there are ideas of sense, reflection, and imagination. So, ordinary objects, as known, are collections of ideas marked by a single name. Berkeley's example is an apple.

If ideas are construed as objects of knowledge, then there must also be something that "knows or perceives them, and exercises divers operations, as willing, imagining, remembering about them" (PHK §2; cf. §6). This Berkeley calls this 'mind' or 'spirit'. Minds (as knowers) are distinct from ideas (as things known). For an idea, to be is to be perceived (known). Since this holds for ideas in general, it holds for "sensations or ideas imprinted on the sense" in particular (§3).

Berkeley contends that the "opinion strangely prevailing amongst men, that houses, mountains, rivers, and in a world all sensible objects have an existence natural or real, distinct from being perceived" is inconsistent, "a manifest contradiction” (PHK §4). If one construes 'sensible objects' as ideas of sense, and ideas are objects of knowledge, then having a real existence distinct from being perceived would require that an object be known (as an idea) and unknown (as a thing distinct from being perceived), which is inconsistent. He explains the source of the error on the basis of the doctrine of abstract ideas (PHK §5), a discussion which parallels the discussion in Introduction §10.

Ordinary objects, as known, are nothing but collections of ideas. If, like Descartes, Berkeley holds that claims of existence are justified if and only if the existent can be known, then ordinary objects must be at least collections of ideas. As Berkeley put it, "all the choir of heaven and furniture of the earth, in a word all those bodies which compose the mighty frame of the world, have not any subsistence without a mind, that their being is to be perceived or known" (PHK §6). The only substance that can be known is a spirit or thinking substance (PHK §7). But notice what has not yet been shown. It has not been shown that ordinary objects are only collections of ideas, nor has it be shown that thinking substances are immaterial. Berkeley's next move is to ask whether there are grounds for claiming ordinary objects are something more than ideas.

The above account is not the only interpretation of the first seven sections of the Principles. Many commentators take a more directly metaphysical approach. They assume that ideas are mental images (Pitcher, p.70; cf. Winkler, p. 13 and Muehlmann, p. 49), or objects of thought (Winker, p.6), or modes of a mental substance (Bracken, pp. 76ff), or immediate objects of perception (Pappas, pp. 21-22), or any of Berkeley's other occasional characterizations of ideas, and proceed to show that, on the chosen account of ideas, Berkeley's arguments fail. A. A. Luce tells us that Berkeley’s characterization of an apple in terms of ideas (PHK §1) is concerned with the apple itself, rather than a known apple (Luce 1963, p. 30; cf. Tipton, p. 70), which suggests that Berkeley begs the question of the analysis of body. Many commentators tell us that what seems to be an allusion to ideas of reflection in the first sentence of §1 cannot be such, since Berkeley claims one has no ideas of minds or mental states (PHK §§27, 89, 140, 142; DHP2 223, DHP3 231-233; cf. Works 2:42n1). They ignore his allusions to ideas of reflection (PHK §§13, 25, 35, 68, 74, 89) and the presumption that if there are such ideas, they are the effects of an active mind (cf. PHK §27). Many commentators suggest that the argument for esse is percipi is in §3 - ignoring the concluding words in §2 – and find the "manifest contradiction" in §4 puzzling at best. Most commentators assume that the case for idealism - the position that there are only minds and mind-dependent entities - is complete by §7 and lament that Berkeley has not established the 'only'. The epistemic interpretation we have been developing seems to avoid these problems.

Berkeley holds that ordinary objects are at least collections of ideas. Are they something more? In §§8-24 Berkeley examines the prime contenders for this "something more," namely, theories of material substance. He prefaces his discussion with his likeness principle, the principle that nothing but an idea can resemble an idea. "If we look but ever so little into our thoughts, we shall find it impossible for us to conceive a likeness except only between our ideas" (PHK §8). Why is this? A claim that two objects resemble each other can be justified only by a comparison of the objects (cf. PC §377, ##16-18). So, if only ideas are immediately perceived, only ideas can be compared. So, there can be no justification for a claim that an idea resembles anything but an idea. If claims of existence rest on epistemically justified principles, the likeness principle blocks both grounds for claiming that there are mediately perceived material objects and Locke's claim that the primary qualities of objects resemble one’s ideas of them (Locke, 1.8.15, p. 137).

One of the marks of the modern period is the doctrine of primary and secondary qualities. Although it was anticipated by Descartes, Malebranche, and others, the terms themselves were introduced in Robert Boyle's "Of the Origins of Forms and Qualities" (1666) and Locke's Essay. Primary qualities are the properties of objects as such. The primary qualities are solidity, extension, figure, number, and mobility (Locke 2.8.9, p. 135; cf. 2.8.10, p. 135). Secondary qualities are either the those arrangements of corpuscles containing only primary qualities that cause one to have ideas of color, sound, taste, heat, cold, and smell (Locke 2.8.8, p. 135; 2.8.10, p. 135) or, on some accounts, the ideas themselves. If the distinction can be maintained, there would be grounds for claiming that ordinary objects are something more than ideas. It is this theory of matter Berkeley considers first.

After giving a sketch of Locke's account of the primary/secondary quality distinction (PHK §9), his initial salvo focuses on his previous conclusions and the likeness principle. "By matter therefore we are to understand an inert, senseless substance, in which extension, figure, and motion, do actually subsist" (PHK §9). Such a view is inconsistent with his earlier conclusions that extension, figure, and motion are ideas. The likeness principle blocks any attempt to go beyond ideas on the basis of resemblance. Combining the previous conclusions with the standard account of primary qualities requires that primary qualities both exist apart from the mind and only in the mind. So, Berkeley concludes that "what is called matter or corporeal substance, involves a contradiction in it" (PHK §9). He then turns to the individual qualities.

If there is a distinction between primary and secondary qualities, there must be a ground for the distinction. Indeed, given the common contention that an efficient cause must be numerically distinct from its effect (see Arnauld and Nicole, p. 186; Arnauld in Descartes, 2:147; Locke 2.26.1-2, pp. 324-325), if one cannot show that primary and secondary qualities are distinct, there are grounds for questioning the causal hypothesis. Berkeley argues that there is no ground for the distinction. Appealing to what one knows - ideas as they are conceived – Berkeley argues that one cannot conceive of a primary quality such as extension without some secondary quality as well: one cannot "frame an idea of a body extended and moved, but I must withal give it some colour or other sensible quality which is acknowledged to exist only in the mind" (PHK §10). If such sensible qualities as color exist only in the mind, and extension and motion cannot be known without some sensible quality, there is no ground for claiming extension exists apart from the mind. The primary/secondary quality distinction collapses. The source of the philosophical error is cited as the doctrine of abstract ideas. His arguments in Principles §§11-15 show that no evidence can be found that any of the other so-called primary qualities can exist apart from the mind.

After disposing of the primary/secondary quality distinction, Berkeley turns to an older theory of material substance, a substratum theory. At least since Aristotle, philosophers had held that qualities of material objects depend on and exist in a substance which has those qualities. This supposed substance allegedly remains the same through change. But if one claims there are material substances, one must have reasons to support that claim. In Principles §§16-24 Berkeley develops a series of arguments to the effect that (1) one cannot form an idea of a substratum, (2) the theory of material substance plays no explanatory role, and (3) it is impossible to produce evidence for the mere possibility of such an entity.

Can one form an idea a substratum? No. At least one cannot form a positive idea of a material substratum itself - something like an image of the thing itself - a point that was granted by its most fervent supporters (see Descartes 1:210; Locke 2.23.3, p. 295). The most one can do is form "An obscure and relative Idea of Substance in general" (Locke 2.23.3, p. 296), “though you know not what it is, yet you must be supposed to know what relation it bears to accidents, and what is meant by its supporting them" (PHK §16). Berkeley argues that one cannot make good on the notion of 'support' - "It is evident support cannot here be taken in its usual or literal sense, as when we say that pillars support a building: in what sense therefore must it be taken?" (PHK §16) - so one does not even have a relative idea of material substratum. Without a clear notion of the alleged relation, one cannot single out a material substance on the basis of a relation to something perceived (PHK §17).

If an idea of a material substratum cannot be derived from sense experience, claims of its existence might be justified if it is necessary to provide an explanation of a phenomenon. But no such explanation is forthcoming. As Berkeley notes: "But what reason can induce us to believe the existence of bodies without the mind, from what we perceive, since the very patrons of matter themselves do not pretend, there is any necessary connexion betwixt them and our ideas? I say it is granted on all hands (and what happens in dreams, phrensies, and the like, puts it beyond dispute) that it is possible we might be affected with all the ideas we have now, though no bodies existed without, resembling them" (PHK 18). Since material substance is not necessary to provide an explanation of mental phenomena, reason cannot provide grounds for claiming the existence of a material substance.

Berkeley's final move against material substance is sometimes called the "Master Argument." It takes the form of a challenge, one on which Berkeley is willing to rest his entire case. "It is but looking into your own thoughts, and so trying whether you can conceive it possible for a sound, or figure, or motion, or colour, to exist without the mind, or unperceived. This easy trial may make you see, that what you contend for, is a downright contradiction" (PHK §22). Berkeley seems to argue that in any case one might consider - books in the back of a closet, plants deep in a wood with no one about, footprints on the far side of the moon - the objects are related to the mind conceiving of them. So, it is contradictory to claim that those objects have no relation to a mind (PHK, §§22-23; cf. DHP1 199-201). This is generally not considered Berkeley at his best, since many commentators argue that it is possible to distinguish between the object conceived and the conceiving of it. George Pappas has provided a more sympathetic interpretation of the passage. He contends that Berkeley is calling for an "impossible performance" (Pappas, pp. 141-144). Conceivability is the ground for claiming that an object is possible. If one conceives of an object, then that object is related to some mind, namely, the mind that conceives it. So, the problem is that it is not possible to fulfill the conditions necessary to show that it would be possible for an object to exist apart from a relation to a mind.

Thus, Berkeley concludes, there are no grounds for claiming that an ordinary object is more than a collection of ideas. The arguments in §§1-7 showed that ordinary objects are at least collections of ideas of sense. The arguments in §§8-24 provide grounds for claiming that ordinary objects are nothing more than ideas. So, Berkeley is justified in claiming that they are only ideas of sense. Berkeley's argument for immaterialism is complete, although he has not yet provided criteria for distinguishing ideas of sense from ideas of memory and imagination. This is his task in §§29-33. Before turning to this, Berkeley introduces several remarks on mind.

Berkeley claims that an inspection of our ideas shows that they are causally inert (PHK §25). Since there is a continual succession of ideas in our minds, there must be some cause of it. Since this cause can be neither an idea nor a material substance, it must be a spiritual substance (PHK §26). This sets the stage for Berkeley's argument for the existence of God and the distinction between real things and imaginary things.

One knows that one causes some of one's own ideas (PHK §28). Since the mind is passive in perception, there are ideas which one's own mind does not cause. Only a mind or spirit can be a cause. "There is therefore some other will or spirit that produces them" (PHK §29). As such, this is not an argument for the existence of God (see PHK §§146-149), although Berkeley's further discussion assumes that at least one mind is the divine mind.

He is now in a position to distinguish ideas of sense from ideas of the imagination: "The ideas of sense are more strong, lively, and distinct than those of the imagination; they have likewise a steadiness, order, and coherence, and are not excited at random, as those which are the effects of human wills often are" (PHK §30). This provides the basis for both the distinction between ideas of sense and ideas of imagination and for the distinction between real things and imaginary things (PHK §33). Real things are composed solely of ideas of sense. Ideas of sense occur with predictable regularity; they form coherent wholes that themselves can be expected to "behave" in predictable ways. Ideas of sense follow (divinely established) laws of nature (PHK §§30. 34, 36, 62, 104).

So, Berkeley has given an account of ordinary objects without matter. Ordinary objects are nothing but lawfully arranged collections of ideas of sense.

5. Notions

If one reads the Principles and Dialogues, one discovers that Berkeley has little to say regarding our knowledge of minds, and most of what is found was added in the 1734 editions of those works. The reason is Berkeley originally intended the Principles to consist of at least three parts (cf. PC §583). The second was to examine issues germane to mind, God, morality, and freedom (PC §§508, 807). He told Samuel Johnson, his American correspondent, that the manuscript for the second part was lost during his travels in Italy in about 1716 (Works 2:282). In the 1734 editions of the Principles and Dialogues, Berkeley included brief discussions of our notions of minds.

Berkeley claims we do not have ideas of minds, since minds are active and ideas are passive (PHK §27; cf. §89, 140, 142). Nonetheless, "we have some notion of soul, spirit, and the operations of the mind, such as willing, loving, hating, in as much as we know or understand the meaning of those words" (PHK §27, 1734 edition). Given Berkeley's theory of meaning, this seems to imply that so long as one able to pick out (distinguish) minds from other things one can have a notion of mind. Since Berkeley remarks, "Such is the nature of spirit or that which acts, that it cannot be of it self perceived, but only by the effects which it produceth" (PHK §27, all editions), one might come to believe that Berkeley knows minds in much the same way as Locke knows them. Locke claims one has a relative idea of substance in general (Locke 2.23.3, p. 296): one is able to pick out a substance as such on the basis of its relation to a directly perceived idea or quality. While nominally distinct from Lockean relative ideas, Berkeley could claim that notions pick out an individual mind as the thing that perceives some determinate idea (one's own mind) or which causes some determinate idea (God or, perhaps, some other spirit). Since Berkeley held that causal and perceptual relations are necessary connections, this seems to avoid the problems with 'support' discussed in Principles §16. Such a position seems to be consistent with everything said in the Principles and much of what is said in the Dialogues (DHP2 2:223; DHP3 2:232-233). However, there are two passages in the Third Dialogue which suggest that one's own mind is known directly, rather than relatively. Philonous says:

I own I have properly no idea, either of God or any other spirit; for these being active, cannot be represented by things perfectly inert, as our ideas are. I do nevertheless know, that I who am a spirit or thinking substance, exist as certainly, as I know my ideas exist. Farther, I know what I mean by the terms I and myself; and I know this immediately, or intuitively, though I do not perceive it as I perceive a triangle, a colour, or a sound. (DHP3 2:231, all editions)

How often must I repeat, that I know or am conscious of [my emphasis] my own being; and that I my self am not my ideas, but somewhat else, a thinking active principle that perceives, knows, wills, and operates about ideas. (DHP3 233, 1734 edition)

If you know yourself immediately "by a reflex act" (DHP3 232, all editions), and if this is independent of any relation to an idea, then it would seem that notions of oneself are nothing more than that unique way in which the mind knows itself. Nothing more can be said of them. Such a position seems to make notions an ad hoc addition to Berkeley's philosophy.

But, perhaps, we need to draw a distinction between knowing that there is a mind and knowing what a mind is. Perhaps one might know directly that one has a mind, but one can know what a mind is only relative to ideas: a mind is that which causes or perceives ideas. One should not be surprised if this is Berkeley's position. Such a relative understanding of the mind as knower and ideas as the known is already found in the opening sections of the Principles.

6. Concluding Remarks

According to Berkeley, the world consists of nothing but minds and ideas. Ordinary objects are collections of ideas. Already in his discussion of vision, he argued that one learns to coordinate ideas of sight and touch to judge distance, magnitude, and figure, properties which are immediately perceived only by touch. The ideas of one sense become signs of ideas of the other senses. In his philosophical writings, this coordination of regularly occurring ideas becomes the way the world is known and the way humans construct real things. If there are only minds and ideas, there is no place for some scientific constructs. Newtonian absolute space and time disappear. Time becomes nothing but the succession of ideas in individual minds (PHK §98). Motion is entirely object-relative (PHK §§112-117). Science becomes nothing more than a system of natural signs. With the banishing of abstraction, mathematics is reduced to a system of signs in which words or numerals signify other words or numerals (PHK §122). Space is reduced to sensible extension, and since one cannot actually divide a piece of extension into an infinite number of sensible parts, various geometrical paradoxes dissolve. As Berkeley understands them, science and Christian theology become compatible.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Berkeley, George. Philosophical Works, Including the Works on Vision. Edited by Michael R. Ayers. Everyman edition. London: J. M. Dent, 1975.
    • This is the most comprehensive one-volume edition of Berkeley's philosophical works available. When the work is not divided into sections, marginal references are made to the page in The Works of George Berkeley.
  • Berkeley, George. The Works of George Berkeley, Bishop of Cloyne. Edited by A. A. Luce and T. E. Jessop. 9 volumes. London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1948-1957.
    • This is the standard edition of Berkeley's works. Page references above are to this edition.
  • Arnauld, Antoine and Nicole, Pierre. Logic or the Art of Thinking. Translated by Jill Vance Buroker. Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • This was one of the most widely-read logic textbooks of the early modern period.
  • Atherton, Margaret. Berkeley's Revolution in Vision. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990.
  • Belfrage, Bertil. "Towards a New Interpretation of Berkeley's Theory of Vision" (in French). In Dominique Berlioz, editor, Berkeley: language de la perception et art de voir. Paris: Presses Universitires de France, 2003.
  • Berman, David. George Berkeley: Idealism and the Man. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994.
  • Boyle, Robert. Selected Philosophical Papers of Robert Boyle. Edited by M. S. Stewart. Philosophical Classics. Manchester: University of Manchester Press, 1979.
  • Bracken, Harry M. Berkeley. Philosophers in Perspective. New York: St. Martin's Press, 1974.
  • Dancy, Jonathan. Berkeley: An Introduction. Oxford: Blackwell, 1987.
  • Descartes, René. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. Translated and edited by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Steward, and (volume 3) Anthony Kenny. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985, 1984, 1991.
  • Flage, Daniel E. Berkeley's Doctrine of Notions: A Reconstruction based on his Theory of Meaning. London and New York: Croom Helm and St. Martin's Press, 1987.
  • Grayling, A. C. Berkeley: The Central Arguments. La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1986.
  • Locke, John. An Essay concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Luce, A. A. Berkeley's Immaterialism: A Commentary on his "A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge". London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1945.
  • Luce, A. A. The Dialectic of Immaterialism. London: Hodder and Stroughton, 1963.
  • Muehlmann, Robert G. Berkeley's Ontology. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1992.
  • Pappas, George S. Berkeley's Thought. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2000.
  • Pitcher, George. Berkeley. The Arguments of the Philosophers. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1977.
  • Stoneham, Tom. Berkeley's World: An Examination of the Three Dialogues. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
  • Tipton, I. C. Berkeley: The Philosophy of Immaterialism. London: Methuen, 1974.
  • Warnock, G. J. Berkeley. London: Penquin, 1953.
  • Winkler, Kenneth P. Berkeley: An Interpretation. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989.

Author Information

Daniel E. Flage
James Madison University
U. S. A.

Johann Georg Hamann (1730—1788)

HamannJohann Georg Hamann was the philosophically most sophisticated thinker of the German Counter-enlightenment. Born in 1730 in Königsberg in eastern Prussia, Hamann was a contemporary and friendly acquaintance of the philosopher Immanuel Kant, and in many ways Hamann’s career can be seen in parallel to that of his great friend. Like Kant, Hamann attended the University of Königsberg, and in his early life was a devoted partisan of the Enlightenment, the philosophical and literary movement that emphasized the clearing away of outdated prejudice and the application of scientific reason to every area of human life. But during a business trip to London (on behalf of the firm of the Berens family, who also published Kant’s works), Hamann underwent a sort of conversion that involved giving up his commitment to the secular Enlightenment in favor of a more orthodox view of Protestant Christianity. As a consequence, he embarked on a career of trenchant and often scathing criticism of the Enlightenment. This change in world-views coincided with his reading of the British empiricist philosophers George Berkeley and David Hume. Hamann saw the idealism of the former and the skepticism of the latter as constituting a reductio ad absurdum of Enlightenment thought: Scientific reason leads us inevitably either to doubt or to deny the reality of the world around us. Three of Hamann’s intellectual achievements are of particular significance: His writings Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten (Socratic Memorabilia) and Aesthetica in nuce (Aesthetics in a Nutshell), in which he opposed Enlightenment thought with an indirect and ironic mode of discourse emphasizing the importance of aesthetic experience and the role of genius in intuiting nature; his views on language; and his influential criticisms of Kant’s critical thought, expressed in his "Metakritik über den Purismum der Vernunft" and in his commentary, in a letter to Johann Gottfried Herder, on Kant’s essay "What is Enlightenment?"

Table of Contents

  1. Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten and Aesthetica in nuce
  2. Hamann’s Views on Language
  3. "Metacritique" of Kant
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Works in German
    2. Works in English
    3. Works in English that Discuss Hamann

1. Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten and Aesthetica in nuce

Hamann's rejection of the Enlightenment was greeted with distress by his friends Kant and Berens. Although they hoped that he could be won back to the cause of reason, these hopes were dashed with the publication in 1759 of Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten, and the following year of Aesthetica in nuce. Together these two works offer a world-view that might be described as antirationalist but not irrationalist.

Hamann's intention in the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten is to offer a defense of religious faith that renders such faith immune against rational attack while in no way accepting the rationalist’s terms of debate. In order to do this, however, he faces a seemingly insoluble problem: He must undermine the grounds of the Enlightenment view of reason and religion without committing himself to other, opposed positions that are subject to rational criticism and refutation. Several aspects of how he goes about this were very influential in German thought in the 18th century. First, the work is written under a pseudonym, or rather, not under any name at all: The title page says that the Denkwürdigkeiten were "assembled for the boredom of the public by a lover of boredom," most likely a reference to the Enlighteners’ desire to educate the public in the name of reason. By distancing himself from the authorship of what was probably his most important work, Hamann makes clear that any arguments offered or positions taken in the book ought to be viewed as moves in a game rather than as expressions of his rational faculty. Second, Hamann makes crucial use of irony, specifically Socratic irony, in his attack on the Enlightenment. "I have," says Hamann at the beginning of the work, "written about Socrates in a Socratic manner. Analogy was the soul of his syllogisms, and he gave them irony as their body." Specifically, Hamann holds up Socrates, the philosophers’ secular saint, in order to draw an unfavorable contrast between him and the Enlightenment. Despite his wisdom, Socrates explicitly renounced his claim to know the answers to the questions he asked; rather than taking and defending determinate positions on the issues he was interested in, Socrates engaged his listeners in conversation so as to bring them to realize that they did not know the answers to these questions any more than Socrates did. Similarly, Hamann intends the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten to show that Berens and Kant are (at least) as far from genuine knowledge as he is. Finally, like all of Hamann’s works, the style of the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten is intentionally opaque: In contrast to the Enlightenment emphasis on universal truths that transcend the time and place in which they are expressed, Hamann fills his text with oblique allusions to a wide variety of texts in several languages; moves from one point to another with little indication of how the various passages are supposed to hang together; and shifts without warning from careful argumentative analysis to citation of texts to something like oracular declamation. As a result, it is impossible for the reader to forget that the text she is reading is the work of a particular individual writing in a particular time and place, rather than expressing timeless deliverances of reason.

How then does the text of the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten accomplish the defense of religious faith Hamann desires? The chief contention of the work is that religious faith is neither based on nor subject to reason. Here Hamann relies not so much on Socrates but rather on David Hume, whose skeptical writings had affected him so deeply a few years before. Hume would doubtless have found little to his liking in Hamann's rejection of the Enlightenment, but Hamann found much in Hume to serve his purposes. Specifically, Hamann adapts Hume’s important claim that "belief... [etc.]." Hume intends this as a way of answering the worst sort of skepticism: If our beliefs are not based on reasoning, then reasoning cannot threaten them, either. Hamann makes use of the fact that in German there is one word, 'Glaube,’ that corresponds both to ‘belief’ and to ‘faith’ in English. Thus in his hands Hume’s claim is extended to religious faith as well, making it immune from rational criticism. But this is not to be understood as a position taken with debates about the philosophical foundations of religion. Instead, Hamann again makes use of the figure of Socrates. He compares Socrates to someone refusing to join a game of cards: If this person didn’t know how to play, Hamann observes, we might take their refusal as an expression of incapacity, much as we would take an expression of ignorance from an ordinary person as a genuine indication that he lacks knowledge. But in the case of Socrates, who was manifestly a deep thinker and great philosopher, professions of ignorance must be read as refusals to participate in a game in which the other players "break the rules of the game and steal its joy [das Glück desselben stehlen]. Socrates’ ignorance thus became a "thorn in the eyes" of the sophists (here again Kant and Berens are clearly intended) and serve as "testimony" against the "new Athenians" of Hamann’s time, who deified Socrates "in order to be better able to mock the carpenter’s son [Jesus]."

But if Socrates was a great philosopher, as Hamann emphasizes, what can he be said to know? Hamann's answer to this question is 'genius.’

What in Homer makes up for the ignorance of artistic rules, that Aristotle thought up after him, and what in Shakespeare makes up for the ignorance or violation of these rules? Genius (Genie) is the unambiguous answer. Socrates could thus well have been ignorant; he had a genius (Genius) on whose knowledge he could rely, and who he feared as his God.Hamann's use of the notion of genius in the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten serves as a bridge to his second major work, the Aesthetica in nuce. His target in the Aesthetica is Enlightenment thought as it applies specifically to art and beauty. Aesthetics in the Enlightenment alternated between attempts to reduce art to rules, more specifically rules for the accurate and morally uplifting imitation of nature, and attempts to explain art as a response to the subjective human capacity for feeling and sensation. Hamann emphatically rejects both of these tendencies, along with the devaluation of the aesthetic he seems them as implying. Far from being reducible to rational principles, in his view aesthetic experience is a fundamental and immediate experience of nature, which he encapsulates (both in the Aesthetica and in Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten) under the term 'genius.’

The chief philosophical significance of the Aesthetica in nuce is that Hamann here deepens his conception of the connection between artistic genius, nature, and God. Nature, he says, is "a speech through creation to creation." That is, nature is a text written by God, which, being creatures ourselves, we are able to understand through His grace. But this understanding is of course not a rational one, through concepts and scientific investigation. Rather, in aesthetic experience we grasp nature in a manner that precedes, and indeed forms the basis for, rational thought: "Poetry [Poesie] is the native tongue of the human race, just as gardening is older than agriculture, painting older than writing, chant older than declamation, similes older than conclusions, and barter than trade." This view has radical consequences for the Enlightenment. Whereas the task of philosophical aesthetics in the early modern period was to incorporate aesthetic experience into the rational worldview, Hamann now argues that we must instead do the former, that is, view reason as one aspect of our aesthetic experience of the world. It is thus pointless to try to formulate rational standards for beauty. Second, giving art priority over reason threatens reason's claim to be the