Category Archives: 19th Century European

Nietzsche, Friedrich: Philosophy of History

Friedrich Nietzsche: Philosophy of History

NietzscheNietzsche was well-steeped in his contemporary methods and debates in the philosophy of history, which carried over into his philosophy in essential ways. Once a prodigy in classical philology, Nietzsche’s philosophy is everywhere concerned with traditions, historical shifts in custom and meaning, and, to adapt his key expression, "how things become what they are". Beyond these, Nietzsche was closely concerned with the manner these traditions are recorded, emphasized or covered over, as accords the subjective dynamic of those who would claim to know and re-present the past. His earliest philosophical books are marked by an attempt to incorporate Schopenhauer’s notion of timeless ideas into Jakob Burckhardt’s language of historiographical typology. His middle and mature works offer important critiques of both sides of the 19th Century ‘history wars’. Against the Hegelians, Nietzsche rejects efforts to systemize history within rational frameworks as well as teleological schemes generally. Against the ‘Berlin School’ of scientific historiography, he rejects the possibility of subject-free objectivity, realist description, and deductive explanations as to why things happened as they did. In his later thinking, Nietzsche devises his own genealogical mode of writing about the past in response to evolutionary accounts of the development of morals.

This article will trace the context and evolution of Nietzsche’s philosophy of history throughout his career. Attention will be paid, too, to its reception by thinkers in the twentieth and twenty-first centuries.

Table of Contents

  1. Schulpforta
  2. Bonn and Leipzig
  3. Basel
  4. Physiognomy and Teleology
  5. Réealism and Genealogy
  6. Reception
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. Schulpforta

Nietzsche enrolled at Schulpforta in 1858 at the age of fourteen. The four hundred year-old school was long the standard of humane education in Germany. During Nietzsche’s time there, the character of the school mirrored that of its most venerable literary scholar and historian Friedrich August Koberstein. Embracing those same two disciplines himself, Nietzsche’s first extensive historiographical project covered the saga of the fourth century Ostrogoth King Ermanarich (KGW I/2, 274-284). Even then Nietzsche tried his hand at various historiographic expressions. In 1861, he wrote a symphonic poem entitled Serbia (BAW 2, 32-37). The following year, he presented to his friends Wilhelm Pinder and Gustav Krug three additional “Hungarian Sketches” in imitation of Liszt, whose daughter Cosima was to become Cosima van Bulow and then Cosima Wagner. In the fall of that year, Nietzsche outlined the composition of a dramatic production entitled ‘Ermanarich’ (BAW 2, 144-54), and as late as the summer of 1865, he was considering the performance of an Ermanarich, Oper in drei Akten (BAW 3, 123-4).

Nietzsche’s problem, foremost, is one of conflicting historical sources. Ermanarich, king of Oium in the early 300’s, had been confused over time with various old tribal kings of gothic Germany, like Hermenrich and Emelrich, and the old Danish tribal leader Jarmarich of whom Saxo Grammaticus spoke (BAW 2, 306). His name is Eormenric in the English epic Beowulf and Jörmunrekkr in old Norse songs. His story had been manipulated most egregiously by the chroniclers of the Anglo-Saxons who sought to associate the notoriously cruel and rapacious traits of Attila the Hun with all of their Eastern foes. Whoever Ermanarich actually was, and whatever the factual details of his life and death were, is likely unrecoverable given the discontinuity of the extant historical evidence. But Nietzsche did not rest at the level of philological skepticism. In this, as in his earliest published articles on Theognis and Diogenes Laertius, he constructed a speculative character portrait intended to fill in the missing pieces of the historical story. Such a two-phase meta-historical standpoint—a skeptical realism about the historical sources combined with a psychological constructivism—was indeed cultivated by the instructors at Schulpforta. As Nietzsche’s close friend Karl von Gersdorff would later recall, “[Kobertsein] was pleased in the highest and full of praise for the erudition, the perspicacity, the deductive character and stylistic elegance of his student” (Janz 1993, I 96).

From his work at Schulpforta one can at least begin to outline Nietzsche’s historiographical education in contradistinction to other reigning views. In contrast to Enlightenment historiographers like Voltaire or Gibbon, the young Nietzsche never valorizes his historical figures to make them stand as moral exemplars for our own edification in humanistic ideals. None of the personalities he constructs are enlightened models of rational clarity; each evoke much darker and more earthly psychological compulsions. Nietzsche’s early philological scholarship is in this way more reminiscent of romantic historiography, a likely mark of Koberstein’s influence. Along with Carlyle, Michelet, Schiller, Goethe, and Macaulay, the young Nietzsche conceived the constructive task of the historian as that of a dramaturge who imbues his characters with personality in order to re-enliven formerly lifeless aspects of the past. In the 1850’s and 60’s, the meta-historical theory simultaneously most popular among philosophers and most tendentious among historians was doubtless that put forward by the Hegelian-Marxists. It is apparent that Nietzsche’s Ermanarich project—or for that matter any of his published philology—does not bear even the slightest resemblance to a teleological account, whether idealist or materialist. Ermanarich is not some moment in the march of history, nor some typological phenomenon characteristic of an epoch. Indeed, the conservative religious and constitutionalist leanings of Schulpforta would hardly have been conducive to the Hegelian-Marxist way of thinking.

2. Bonn and Leipzig

Friedrich August Wolf is typically considered the father of German philology. Wolf provided the study of antiquity, more than a generation before Ranke did for historiography generally, its first systematic set of methods and its first aspiration to achieve the same sort of demonstrable progress and rigor as the natural sciences. Wolf’s two most important descendants, Gottfried Hermann and August Boeckh, founded two groups of scholars with antipodal methodologies: the Sprachphilologen and the Sachphilologen respectively. For the former, the scientific status of philology entailed both certainty and objectivity, which in turn meant avoiding as much as possible the intrusion of subjective interpretations of evidence.  To do that, the Sprachphilologen narrowed their net of acceptable evidence to that which allegedly needed no interpretation, to that form of evidence whose meaning would allegedly be manifest to whoever could observe it: the written word. The Sachphilologen, on the contrary, considered science as a means of circumscribing the whole of experience. That whole, with respect to antiquity, could be elucidated in part through written accounts, to be sure, but only in part. What counted equally as evidence were the artifacts of antiquity: the plastic arts, the architecture, the coinage, even the clothing, athletics, tools, and playthings. None of these phenomena speaks for itself in the way the written word does. Each requires the understanding of the historian to reconstruct what their meaning might have been—each historical phenomenon, in other words, is meaningful only within a scheme of hermeneutical interpretation. Something of the objectivity and exactitude is lost therein; but the sacrifice is repaid by attaining a more comprehensive sense of antiquity through the totality of its artifacts.

The overwhelming portion of training Nietzsche received in the methods of professional historiography was philological. But in place of a single unitary lesson, Nietzsche found himself immersed directly in a debate about the meaning of the field itself during his education at both Bonn and Leipzig. His teacher Friedrich Ritschl was the student of Hermann and of Hermann’s student Karl Christian Reisig. Otto Jahn, like Nietzsche a Schulpforta graduate, went on to study with Hermann in Leipzig and Lachmann in Berlin. But Jahn was also a student of Boeckh at Berlin, and was considered alongside his friend Theodor Mommsen one of the defenders of Sachphilologie.

Ritschl’s pedagogy mimicked Wolf’s in its holistic approach to shaping not just scholars but men. Yet in his scholarship, he was clearly an adherent of the rigor and discipline of Hermann’s Sprachphilologie. Jahn was equally scientific in terms of rigor. But in keeping with Sachphilologie, he ventured beyond the written word and investigated the wholeness of culture, especially by applying philological methodology to the objects of archeology. In the school year of 1864-5, the same year that Nietzsche entered Bonn, Ritschl and Jahn engaged in a petty yet field-altering squabble that came to be known as the Bonnerstreit. Although Nietzsche took Jahn’s side in the matter—as he wrote to Gersdorff, “Here in Bonn the biggest flap, the worst cattiness about the Jahn-Ritschlstreit still dominates. I consider Jahn unconditionally right” (an Gersdorff 25.5.1865, KSB 2, 56)—he nevertheless had no palpable interest in Jahn’s archeological, artistic, or numismatical studies. His philological articles in those years on Theognis and Diogenes Laertius show a methodological allegiance to Ritschl’s Sprachphilologie, and retain the basic strategy of his earlier effort on Ermanarich in that they rely both on a skeptical realism about the authenticity of the texts and the construction of a Charakterbild in order to supply the psychological motivations for the agents’ behaviors in the historical stories. Both of Nietzsche’s projects were lauded by Ritschl, who transferred to the University of Leipzig, and indeed both were published in his still-active journal, Rheinisches Museum für Philologie. On their merits, Nietzsche famously graduated from Leipzig without a formal dissertation and was given appointment at the University of Basel as a replacement for another of Ritschl’s students, Adolf Kiessling.

3. Basel

In 1869, Nietzsche presented the lecture “Homer und die klassische Philologie” (KGW II/1, 247-69), full of hope for the potential of a renewed and invigorated field. Toward the end of the lecture, however, he declares that that goal must be accomplished by recognizing a new philosophical basis, that “each and every philological activity should be enclosed by and proceed from a philosophical worldview” (KGW II/1, 268). The reference is clearly to Schopenhauer, whom he had begun to read already in the Fall of 1865. Nietzsche and most of his associates at the time sought to combine Schopenhauer’s teaching with historiography. His childhood friend Paul Deussen studied oriental history and culture with Swami Vivekananda—and would found the Schopenahuer-Gesellschaft in 1911. Richard Wagner, who fancied himself at times the reviver of the ‘true’ historical Germanic culture, sent a personal copy of his Nibelungen directly to Schopenhauer, and sometimes touted that his opera was the expression of Schopenhauer's aesthetics. Erwin Rohde, himself the author of what remains one of the finest scholarly books on Ancient mystery cults and ‘Dionysian’ culture, Psyche: Seelencult und Unsterblichkeitsglaube der Griechen (1890-4), was a lifelong Schopenhauerian. Johann Jacob Bachofen’s psychology of the dark anti-rational undercurrents of ancient history in his Das Mutterrecht (1861) and his critique of scientific ‘objectivity’ both intimate Schopenhauerian influence. And although he is sometimes thought to be anti-philosophical, Jakob Burckhardt was an overt Schopenhauerian—as well as the most renowned cultural historian of his generation.

Nietzsche and Burckhardt had similar upbringings insofar as their introductions to the critical methods of philology extinguished the flame of their devotion to Christianity. Like Burckhardt, too, Nietzsche came to view the obsessive source criticism of Sprachphilologie as a necessary correction of romantic historiography, but also as a potentially detrimental step in the development of an individual scholar and, eventually, in the development of culture. The concern for both at this time is not to report the past with an unattainable degree of objectivity, “wie es eigentlich gewesen ist,” as Burckhardt’s teacher Leopold von Ranke demanded. Rather, “a single source happily chosen can,” for Burckhardt, “do duty for a whole multitude of possible other sources, since he who is really determined to learn, that is, to become rich in spirit, can by a simple unction of his mind, discern and feel the general in the particular” (Burckhardt 1930-4, VII 15). Burckhardt sought to intuit that which was constant, universal, and typical from the welter of particular passing forms. Like Schopenhauer, who himself—despite a massive historical erudition and a cordial acquaintance with Wolf—had almost nothing positive to say about historiography, Burckhardt believed that only the timeless and universal could rise to the level of truth, hence his and Nietzsche’s focus on Kulturgeschichte rather than the passing intrigues of political history. Furthermore, like Nietzsche (at least in these years), but in contradistinction to Schopenhauer, Burckhardt believed that the proper study of history could reveal precisely that: typological traits within people, forms of personalities, and characteristics of epochs. As Burckhardt writes, “Our point of departure is the one and the only thing which lasts in history and is its only possible center: man, this suffering, striving and active being, as he is and was and will forever be” (Burckhardt 1930-4, VII, 3). Indeed, as Nietzsche echoes in his preface to his Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (1873), “I am going to emphasize only that point of each of their systems which constitutes a piece of character and hence belongs to that non-controvertible, non-discussable evidence which it is the task of history to preserve: […]” (PtG, P; KSA 1, 801f). For both Burckhardt and Nietzsche, what was most worthy of being taken up by history was never the common or mundane person, but the ‘great man’. For Burckhardt this mainly meant the leading figures of Renaissance Italy, while for Nietzsche, Pre-Socratic Greeks appeared like giants calling to each other in the spirit of competition from atop high mountain peaks.

However true to the philosophy of Schopenhauer Burckhardt styled himself, his conception of the historian’s ability to intuit common formal patterns within the myriad variegations of historical personages was closer to Goethe’s morphology than to Schopenhauer’s aesthetische Anschauung (Gay 1974, 178f). For Goethe, the close observation of the biological development of organic objects, as much as the composition of the dramatic development of a literary character, would reveal Urphänomene or the primary forms of the phenomenon which guided their development. In his dramatic works, Goethe sought to portray the Steigerung of typological characters like Werther, Tasso, or Goetz, whose development over time is not the alteration or transformation of character but its intensification over time. Burckhardt thought the historian’s task was similar insofar as the careful study of historical documents would reveal typological traits among great people, the course of whose development only intensified what was necessarily there from the start.

For Schopenhauer, by contrast, aesthetic intuition was never about discovering typical recurrences in history or a developmental intensification, but gazing beyond the ‘veil of Maya’ in a partial break from the spatio-temporal forms of subjective willing. Aesthetic intuition for Schopenhauer was a non-intellectual and thus non-discursive Auffassung of the Ideas which constitute the first objectification of the one panenthetic Will (that is, the will of a God who is everywhere and in everything). Aesthetic apprehension can only occur when these instrumental satisfactions in the here and now have been removed entirely, when the will of the spectator is silenced. In contrast to art, historiography was merely like science insofar as it only ever studied its objects subjectively, that is, insofar as they might satisfy the demands of the individuated will (Schopenhauer 1977, X/2 459f). Just as the sciences study their objects in order to use them, benefit from them, or solve problems with them, historians only research the topics they do with an eye toward explaining what was previously unknown, solving mysteries, or perhaps toward finding insights to contemporary problems. Indeed, precisely because of the subjective and necessarily temporal judgments of history, Schopenhauer, in opposition to both Burckhardt and Nietzsche at this time, esteemed history insufficient to attain the “deep truths” of the world in the manner of great art. “Wherever it is a question of knowledge of cause and effect or of grounds and consequences of any kind,” writes Schopenhauer, “that is to say in all branches of natural science and mathematics, as also in history, or with inventions, etc., the knowledge sought must be an aim of the will” (Schopenhauer 1977, X/2, 459f). Burckhardt and Nietzsche both thought that history failed to attain the level of science, but for different reasons. Unlike science, history is unable to construct laws by which the historian might predict future cases, and, more importantly, should not try to be scientific since its proper aim was not understanding but creating values. But although Burckhardt had nothing to do with the mystical elements of Schopenhauer’s thought, his younger Basel colleague was less concerned with scholarly restraint.

To Burckhardt’s and Ritschl’s consternation, Nietzsche tried to co-opt the Schopenhauerian aesthetic-metaphysical mysticism in his first ‘historical’ work, The Birth of Tragedy (1872). “But our Nietzsche!” Ritschl would write to Wilhelm Vischer, the man who a few years before hired Nietzsche at Basel, “It’s remarkable how in one person two souls live next to each other. On the one side, the strictest method of academic scientific research…on the other this fantastically-overreaching, over enthusiastic, beat-you-senseless, Wagnerian-Schopenhauerian art-mystery-religion-crap [Kunstmysterienreligionsschwärmerei]! […] What really makes me mad is his impiety against his true mother, who had suckled him at her breast: philology” (KSA 15, 46f). The justification for Nietzsche’s claims about the ‘inner’ or ‘real’ nature of tragedy was never intended to have utilized the same methodology as his earlier philology, no longer aiming at a correspondence between the account and what the evidence portrays to be real, as Ritschl sensed easily enough. In claiming that the real origin of tragedy is a happy confluence of Dionysian and Apolline drives at a particular moment in history, Nietzsche instead makes an intuitional claim that transgresses the boundaries of naturalistic explanation. Nietzsche, as Jahn’s student Ulrich von Wilamowitz Moellendorff famously charged, shunned source criticism, neglected linguistic analysis, couldn’t be bothered to footnote, was generally ignorant of archeology, and “revile[d] the historical-critical method, denouncing any intuition which deviates from his own, and [ascribed] a ‘complete misunderstanding of the study of antiquity’ to the age in which philology in Germany, due to Gottfried Hermann and Karl Lachmann was raised to an unprecedented height” (Wilamowitz-Moellendorff 1872, 5). Beyond traditional historical versions of intuition in the manner of Herder or Burckhardt, Nietzsche’s believes his own intuitions about tragedy are true precisely insofar as he has left the phenomenal realm behind and become identified with the inner nature of the tragic world in-itself. Through a sort of mystical echo of the ancient standard of truth as identity between the subject and object, the principle that “like is known by like,” Nietzsche thinks he can communicate the real inner Idea of tragedy:

Only insofar as the genius, during the act of artistic procreation, merges fully with that original artist of the world does he know anything of the eternal essence of art; for in this condition he resembles, miraculously, that uncanny image of fairy-tale which can turn its eyes around and look at itself; now he is at one and the same time subject and object, simultaneously poet, actor, and spectator. (BT 5, KSA 1, 47f.)

Like Wagner, who in his own aesthetic ecstasy was claimed by Nietzsche to have attained a “sort of omniscience [Allwissenheit] … as if the visual power of his eyes hovered not only upon surfaces, but ‘ins Innere’” (BT 22, KSA 1, 140), Nietzsche believed himself to inhabit the sort of aesthetic state of Schopenhauer’s genius. “I had discovered the only historical simile and facsimile of my own innermost experience,—and this led me to apprehend the amazing phenomenon of the Dionysian…” (EH 'Geburt' 2, KSA 6, 311). Another retrospective evaluation claims the work was, “Constructed entirely from precocious, wet-behind-the-ears personal experiences, all of which lay at the very threshold of what could be communicated.” This was apparently because the work was not scientific-philology but was, “located in the territory of art […] perhaps a book for artists with some subsidiary capacity for analysis and retrospection (in other words, for an exceptional type of artist […]), full of psychological innovations and artist-mysteries, with an artist’s metaphysics in the background…” (BT 'Versuch' 2, KSA 1, 13).

4. Physiognomy and Teleology

Shortly before the Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche wrote to Erwin Rohde that “Scholarship, art, and philosophy are growing together inside me to such an extent that one day I’m bound to give birth to centaurs” (Letter to Rohde, January 15th, 1870; KSB 3, 95). Indeed, the book was just that, though it was no longer something to be proud of. Almost immediately after, Nietzsche rescinded his artistic-mystical view about the historian’s ability to intuit the real Ideas, in Schopenhauer’s technical sense, of the nature of tragedy beyond the mediated observation of the past through historical evidence. “For the readers of my earlier writings I wish to expressly clarify that I have abandoned the metaphysical-artistic views that fundamentally govern them” (N Ende 1876-Sommer 1877 23[159], KSA 8, 463). His increasingly skeptical attitude toward the mystical aspect of Schopenhauer’s philosophy led Nietzsche to revise major aspects of his own thought.

In 1874’s vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben, Nietzsche presents three ‘types’ of historian, the critical, antiquarian, and monumental. None of these “merges with the original artist of the world”; none becomes the “subject and object” of their historical study. Instead, each type of historian represents the past according to the rules of an inner necessity, exaggerating or downplaying certain aspects of the past in order to tear down idols, preserve them, or build them up. Each type of historian and their accordant way of representing the past has its advantages and disadvantages for themselves and for the cultures in which they live, but none is able to represent the past as it ‘really’ was since into each of their judgments intrudes their psychologically-determined desires and interests.

If it is, as Nietzsche begins to think, that all judgments are constituted by unconscious psychological dynamics, then the ‘subject-free’ ideal of objectivity must be jettisoned. Certainly, the Schopenhauerian aesthetic escape from individual subjectivity will be impossible; but so will the Rankean ‘disinterested’ vision of scientific objectivity. The best one can hope for historians, Nietzsche thinks, is that the subjective facticities that distort their judgments would be in some sense ‘healthy’, or at least healthier than those judgments that infect modern schoolbooks. Only the strong have the right sort of subjective dynamics that would enable a healthy interpretation of historical events. “If you are to venture to interpret the past you can do so only out of the fullest exertion of the vigor of the present: only when you put forth your noblest qualities in all their strength will you divine what is worth knowing and preserving in the past. Like to like! Otherwise, you will draw the past down to you. Do not believe historiography that does not spring from the head of the rarest minds…” (UB II 6, KSA 1, 293f).

By looking at the psychological conditions within which historians construct their accounts, Nietzsche effectively focuses the ‘historical sense’—“the capacity for quickly guessing the order of rank of the valuations according to which a people, a society, a human being has lived” (BGE 224, KSA 5, 157)—on the historians themselves. “History belongs above all to the active and powerful man,” Nietzsche proclaims—like Schiller or Goethe who view the past as a model for inspiration, not merely to imitate, but as an “incentive to do as others have done and do it better” (UB II, 2,  KSA 1, 259). Among those with highly-ranked drives Nietzsche declares Burckhardt (see among many examples, N Frühling-Sommer 1875 5[58], KSA 8, 56), Thucydides (e.g., GD Antike 2, KSA 6, 155f), Hekataeus (KGW II/5, 229f), Tacitus (N 1885 43[3], KSA 11, 702), Hippolyte Taine (JGB 254, KSA 5, 198), and Ritschl (EH 'klug' 9, KSA 6, 295). Among those badly ranked are Karl Lachmann (N März 1875 3[36], KSA 8, 24), the historian of ancient philosophy Eduard Zeller (KGB II/1, 124), and Overbeck’s confidant Heinrich von Treitschke (EH 'Wagner' 3, KSA 6, 361). Relegated to a secondary consideration is whether these historians’ ‘facts’ are accurate; what is time and again foregrounded is the order of rank of the values and drives according to which their historiographical accounts are constructed.

The same is true of Nietzsche’s evaluation of teleological historiography. Although David Friedrich Strauss (see the entirety of UB I, KSA 1, 159-242) and Hegel (see N Frühling-Sommer 1875 5[58], KSA 8, 57) are also targets, much of what Nietzsche says in the latter chapters of Nutzen und Nachteil about teleological historiography is directed against Eduard von Hartmann (see also N 1884 26[326], KSA 11, 236; N November 1887-März 1888 11[61], KSA 13, 30). Hartmann’s philosophical history of consciousness was largely a synthesis of Schopenhauer’s depiction of the blind world will and Hegel’s teleological unfolding of both mind and the rational course of history itself (Hartmann 1923, I 329). Spiritual and moral progress are guaranteed by the Divine Will, whose ideas are instantiated first within the unconscious desires and drives of early peoples and then in an ever-increasing degree of conscious reflection within civilized nations. The aims of the Divine Will are accomplished, consciously or otherwise, regardless of whatever individuals would like to make of their futures.

Hartmann and the sort of Hegelian teleological historicism he represents have, of course, gone out of fashion. It would be rather absurd in today’s more naturalistic historiographical climate to try to prove that a particular decision by a particular agent was the effect of the Divine Will’s cosmic plan; but the focus of Nietzsche’s critique lay elsewhere. In keeping with his view that judgments are necessarily a function of the psychological fundament of their authors, Nietzsche targets the underlying motivations that would lead Hartmann, and for that matter Hegel, to interpret the historical world as teleological in the first place. What he discovers in these teleological historians is a ‘cynical’ outlook on life generally. Instead of a grim determination to affirm their lives they surrender themselves to the recognition that nothing they do is anything more than a preordained stepping-stone on the march toward the absolute. Teleological historians are driven by a nihilistic desire, by the need, Nietzsche contends, to absolve their own wills: “die volle Hingabe der Persönlichkeit an den Weltprozess” [the total sacrifice of individuality to the world-process] (UB II 9, KSA 1, 316). This surrender of today for the sake of some promised future ideal is a secularized version, Nietzsche ultimately thinks, of the Christian faith in heaven.

Although positivism and teleology are nearly antonyms today, this was not the case in Nietzsche’s century. Comte, and his sociological and economical descendants such as Durkheim and Marx, each envisioned an epochal and progressive scheme of history—a sort of one-way street from a repressed past to an enlightened future. Both, however, were careful to replace Hegel and Hartmann’s extra-natural teleological movers in history with a positivist or materialist theory of explanation respectively. In doing so, they considered their developmental schemes both equally demonstrable and as necessary as those of the natural sciences. “All historical writing,” Marx tells us, “must set out from these natural bases and their modification in the course of history through the action of men” (Marx & Engels 1845, 36). “Scientific history, or sociology,” according to Durkheim, “must be founded upon the direct observation of concrete facts” (Durkheim 1972, 78). Such scientific historical representations rested on their shared hope of ascribing causes that governed the behaviors of either individuals or groups as they undergo their progressive development, and that hope can be traced back to H.T. Buckle, the original ‘scientific historian’, whom Nietzsche himself recognizes in this context (See GM I 4, KSA 5, 262).

Nietzsche rejected grand architectonics whose purpose seemed only to convince people that they will someday soon be better off. He also criticized the efforts to regard the past as unfolding even to non-teleological laws insofar as their effort to deduce nomothetically betrayed either their desire to predict and thereby control future events or else their fear of the unknown. “In other disciplines, generalizations [Allgemeinheiten] are the most important thing since they contain the laws [Gesetze]. But if such assertions as that cited are meant to be valid laws, then we could reply that the historian’s work is wasted. For whatever truth is left in such statements, after subtracting that mysterious and irreducible residue we mentioned earlier, is obvious and even trivial since it is self-evident to anyone with the slightest range of experience” (UB II 6, KSA 1, 291f). While there may have been a certain admiration for positivism’s rigorous and anti-metaphysical methodologies, Nietzsche says very little about any of these proto-sociologists. Most notoriously, Nietzsche never names Marx a single time anywhere in his writing.

5. Réealism and Genealogy

Nietzsche’s rejection of nomothetic schemata that purport to explain historical change, whether metaphysical or naturalistic, does not imply he was a radical outlier of the ‘historical’ 19th-Century. Every bit as historically-concerned as the teleologists, he thinks “philosophy, or that alone which I count it to be, [is] the most general form of history, the attempt to somehow describe and abbreviate in signs the Heraclitean world of becoming…” (N 1885 36[27], KSA 11, 562). Nietzsche’s attempt at historicizing philosophy would endure longer than his friendship with the man who helped to inspire it. For alongside Paul Rée he came to the conviction that values, whether moral, political, aesthetic, or even metaphysical, were a function of drives which were themselves conditioned subconsciously throughout a long historical process. Old religious and Platonic beliefs in good and evil as static metaphysical entities were, for both Rée and Nietzsche, to be replaced with a naturalistic and developmental account about how present-day values derive from a convoluted process of practical and often egoistical considerations. But where for Rée, like Darwin and Lamarck before him, acquired habits become inherited traits due to their role in helping both individuals and societies survive better relative to their competitors, Nietzsche viewed the historical inculcation of moral sentiments as a reflection of group attempts to instantiate power-aims.

In keeping with his exhortation that philosophy become historical, Nietzsche variously endeavors to construct a ‘history of the moral sensations’, a ‘natural history of morals’, and most famously, a Genealogy of Morals (1887), a book whose mission is derived from a deeply historicist conviction. “[W]e need to know about the conditions and circumstances under which the values grew up, developed, and changed…” (GM P 6, KSA 5, 253). To that end, Nietzsche would seem to require a set of demonstrable historical premises: that there really was a time during which a masterly set of values dominated and a later time at which it became displaced by the widely-flung inversion of those values known as slave morality. Indeed he claims to seek, “morality as it really existed and was really lived,” “the real history of morality,” which can “actually be confirmed and has actually existed” (GM P 7, KSA 5, 254).

But doing so enmeshes Nietzsche in considerable meta-historical problems, some of which he himself poses. The Genealogie is above all an attempt to articulate the history of the development of moral values in a way that undermines his contemporaries’ faith in the absoluteness of their own values. It does so on two levels: first by offering an historical explanation that reveals the intrinsically historical rather than absolute character of moral values. Nietzsche had formidable allies on this score in Rée and the ‘English School’ of moral psychology—represented foremost by Herbert Spencer—both of whom followed Charles Darwin’s intimation that even morality should be viewed as an evolutionary phenomenon. But whereas their interpretation of that evolution seemed to guarantee the progressive status of fundamentally Christian values like altruism, honesty, cooperation, and compassion, Nietzsche’s own psychologizing-historiography uncovered a darker underside of morality. In fact, as has been thoroughly argued, the text itself represents something like a new-Darwinism (Richardson 2004) or anti-Darwinism (Johnson 2010), insofar as it rejects evolutionary progress and substitutes a vision of the ‘competition of wills’ as a mechanism to explain historical change. Nietzsche rejects the Darwinian accounts by dismantling their presumptions about the origin of value resting with the recipient rather than the doer of ‘good’ or ‘bad’ deeds, about nature aiming at preservation rather than overcoming, about the passivity and accidental character of propagatory success, and about the possibility and value of altruism within social frameworks. The success of this refutation rests in its being somehow a ‘better’ historical account than social-Darwinian alternative, that is, a more accurate and comprehensive historical account than theirs. Given that Nietzsche offers scant historical data that would support his own interpretation of events—the few proffered etymologies would hardly prove much—his account, as an objective history of morality largely fails to demonstrate Nietzsche’s counter-hypotheses.

It is on the second level, a meta-historical level, that Nietzsche’s Genealogie proves its enduring originality. Nietzsche shows that the very attempt to reconstruct the story of development of morality “as it really happened” is occluded by the recognition that the narrator of events is intrinsic to the story, that the historian himself is no will-less, objective, static point of observation, but was himself a perpetually becoming, value-laden dynamic of subjectivity, who is every bit as historical and drive-constituted as the values he was trying to explain. Contrary to Darwinians of any stripe, Nietzsche recognized that historiography is never about ‘getting the facts straight’, ‘wie es eigentlich gewesen ist’, but about interpreting it according to the drive-informed perspective in which the historian was embedded. Whereas the Darwinians interpreted the historical evolution of morality as if they themselves stood outside of it, for Nietzsche, “[W]e count—after the fact—all the twelve trembling strokes of the clock of our experience, our lives, our being—alas! In the process we keep losing the count. So we remain necessarily strangers to ourselves, we do not understand ourselves, we have to keep ourselves confused” (GM P 1, KSA 5, 247). Values and also that conception of ourselves as the architects of values dynamically affects the way by which one interprets those values, such that the attempt to re-present the ‘first bell’, that original value, free of the distortions of generations of overwriting, reformulating, and above all re-valuing those values, becomes impossible.

How have the moral genealogists reacted so far in this matter? Naively, as is their wont: they highlight some ‘purpose’ in punishment, for example, revenge or deterrence, then innocently place the purpose at the start, as causa fiendi of punishment, and—have finished. But ‘purpose in law’ is the last thing we should apply to the history of the emergence of law: on the contrary, there is no more important proposition for every sort of history than that which we arrive at only with great effort but which we really should reach,—namely that the origin of the emergence of a thing and its ultimate usefulness, its practical application and incorporation into a system of ends, are toto coelo separate; that anything in existence, having somehow come about, is continually interpreted anew, requisitioned anew, transformed and redirected to a new purpose by a power superior to it; that everything that occurs in the organic world consists of overpowering, dominating, and in their turn, overpowering and dominating consist of re-interpretation, adjustment, in the process of which their former ‘meaning’ and ‘purpose’ must necessarily be obscured or completely obliterated. [...] But every purpose and use is just a sign that the will to power has achieved mastery over something less powerful, and has impressed upon it its own meaning of a use function; and the whole history of a ‘thing’, an organ, a tradition can to this extent be a continuous chain of signs, continually revealing new interpretations and adaptations, the causes of which need not be connected even amongst themselves, but rather sometimes just follow and replace one another at random. (GM II, 12; KSA 5, 312)

As this passage offers the most expansive explication of his mature historical theory, it is worth careful investigation. There seem to be three interrelated theses here. First, history practiced rightly must accord the genuine nature of reality. Other ‘genealogists’, who in this context are represented primarily by Nietzsche’s one-time friend Paul Rée and the Darwin-inspired moralists such as Herbert Spencer, are in a better position than ahistorical philosophers such as Plato and Spinoza insofar as they rightly recognize the fluidity of moral concepts. However, where the naively realist genealogists go wrong is in unreflectively presuming that their own interpretations of those moral concepts are somehow true for all time and all people, in other words, that their interpretations of the flow of history somehow stand outside the flow of history (see also Johnson 2010, 116-148; Born 2010, 202-52).

Second, Nietzsche’s mature genealogy adapts what might be called an anti-realist theory of historical explanation and description. Terms like ‘cause’, ‘effect’, and ‘purpose’ are not elements of a ‘real’ world, but signs that have been found useful for communicating meaning intersubjectively. Descriptions like ‘terrorist’, ‘revolution’, and ‘democracy’ identify in language what is actually a non-identical set of loosely-connected phenomena.

Third, and as a consequence of the first two theses, there can be no single ‘absolute’ interpretation of the past. Interpretations are a function of the historical world. Like all phenomena, they change and transmogrify over time in accordance to the deep and often unconscious demands of the agents who construct, accept, or reject those interpretations. The example of punishment in this passage illustrates particularly well how the meaning of a single word shifts over epochs and cultures. What accounts for that shift is the fluctuating power dynamics both within particular historians and among the wider sphere of what a culture considers an historical ‘fact’ over time.

Despite his conviction that philosophy must be historical, then, Nietzsche simultaneously understood writing philosophy historically to be a deeply problematic endeavor. Any attempt to describe or explain a historical event amounts to an illegitimate de-contextualization, an attempt to affix the unaffixable with allegedly static concepts. As he would write to his friend, the historical theologian Franz Overbeck, “At last my mistrust now turns to the question whether history is actually possible? What, then does one want to ascertain [feststellen]?—something, which in a moment of happening, does not itself ‘stand fast’ [‘feststand’]?” (an Overbeck 23.02.1887, KSB 8, 28). The situation is made worse in recognizing that not only is the reality to be described in a state of flux, but the one who recognizes it is in a similar state of flux. Not only has Heraclitus’s river changed, so has the subjectivity of the one who has entered it.

A similar cluster of problems was faced by Neo-Kantian thinkers in the years just following Nietzsche’s Genealogie. Wilhelm Windelband, Heinrich Rickert, and the quasi-Neo-Kantian Wilhelm Dilthey were each keen in their own ways to view historical judgment as a function of subjective facticities rather than as a mirror of an objective past. Each sought, like Nietzsche, to distinguish history from science both in terms of the methodology of its investigations and the sorts of objects it studies. Where science seeks to explain by deduction from general rules, history only contains such generalities in imprecise abstractions. Due to the singularity of every object under its purview, history cannot hope to explain scientifically by means of deduction under general laws. As Windelband phrases it in his inaugural address as rector at Strasbourg, “The nomological sciences are concerned with what is invariably the case. The sciences of process are concerned with what once was the case” (Windelband 1894, 175). The former sciences were famously designated nomothetic, the latter, like historiography, called idiographic. Finally, while historiography does involve the search for explanations in terms of causes, those causes must be regarded as value-imbued. “History,” Rickert writes, “with its individualizing method and its orientation to values, has to investigate the causal relations subsisting among the unique and individual events with which it is concerned. These causal relations do not coincide with any universal laws of nature…the selection of what is essential in history involves reference to values even in the inquiry into causes…” (Rickert 1889, 94; see also Windelband 1884, 205). In place of a universal dogmatic positivist explanation, philosophers of history following the neo-Kantians address which causal account best satisfies the subjective standards of the historians and of their audience. Compare this to Nietzsche’s claim in Ecce Homo, that “we are not looking for just any type of explanatory cause, we are looking for a chosen, preferred type of explanation, one that will most quickly and reliably get rid of the feeling of unfamiliarity and novelty, the feeling that we are dealing with something we have never encountered before,—the most common explanation” (GD Irrthümer 5, KSA 6.93).

6. Reception

Nietzsche rejects attempts to construe a past in-itself without acknowledging the tangled but inextricable web of interpretations cast upon it by later interpreters. “[T]he origin of the emergence of a thing and its ultimate usefulness, its practical application and incorporation into a system of ends, are toto coelo separate; anything in existence, having somehow come about, is continually interpreted anew, requisitioned anew, transformed and redirected to a new purpose” (GM II 12, KSA 5, 313). Any attempt to isolate Nietzsche’s historiographical ideas for the sake of contextualizing them would accordingly demand a reckoning of the many drives of its very many interpreters over the past century or so. Such a genealogical account of Nietzsche’s historiography would be severely unwieldy, if not impossible. It nevertheless serves to mention at least two of the most prominent lines of the interpretive reception of Nietzsche’s meta-history.

Although a broad generalization, continental thinkers from the 1930’s to the 1970’s such as Heidegger, Jaspers, Sartre, Arendt, Levinas, Ricouer and Patočka took their cue from Nietzsche’s demand that the human person be considered within the framework of his or her historicity. Specifically, they each appear influenced by Nietzsche’s 1874 characterization of the human animal as the one unable to ignore his or her temporality; being human means being forever tied to a continual process of becoming, the awareness of which it is our unique burden to bear (UB II 1, KSA 1, 248f). In fact, this single idea is arguably the most essential and unifying theme among all mid-20th Century continental thinkers. One must understand her existential condition as oriented in her birth and propelled toward her future possibilities, which fall under the inescapable common horizon of death. Orienting oneself to one’s history becomes the essential existential project.

Among later postmodern continental thinkers such as Foucault, DeMan, Lacoue-Labarthes, Lyotard, Derrida, and among the most noted contemporary postmodern meta-historians like Hayden White, Frank Ankersmit, and Keith Jenkins, the anthropological focus increasingly shifts to an epistemological one. The view of history as a mirror of the real events of a real objective past is ridiculed as an outdated conservative ideal. Historiography has historically not been used to discover truth, pure and unadulterated—and indeed cannot be. Historical writing hitherto has consisted in a set of authoritative narratives constructed in order to justify existing biases and power structures. Consistent with their interpretation of Nietzsche’s genealogical project, they see the West in a moment of cultural crisis, one which historiography has uncovered and which it must of itself help resolve. Historiography’s task is thus no longer to simply records facts, they hold, but to unmask the so-called ‘objective’ systems of values by deconstructing or revealing as mythic the ideological foundations on which they were built. After those grand-narratives have been exposed, historiography’s myth-making capacities are to be refocused to allow previously underrepresented groups to construct the story from their own perspectives. One senses here the rather freely-interpreted application of Nietzsche’s claim that “the more eyes, different eyes we learn to set upon the same object, the more complete will be our ‘concept’ of this thing, the more ‘objective’” (GM III 12, KSA 5, 365), but they are nevertheless correct to acknowledge the debt their own conception of power-interpretation owes to Nietzsche.

7. References and Further Reading

  • BAW: Historisch-kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, 5 vols., edited by Joachim Mette et al. (Berlin, 1933–43).
  • KGB: Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Briefwechsel, edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1975ff).
  • KGW: Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1967ff).
  • KSA: Sämtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe, 15 vols., edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1988).
  • KSB: Sämtliche Briefe: Kritische Studienausgabe, 8 vols., edited by Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari (Berlin, 1986).

a. References

  • Born, Marcus Andreas, Nihilistisches Geschichtsdenken: Nietzsches perspektivische Genealogie (München: Wilhelm Fink, 2010).
  • Burckhardt, Jakob, Gesamtausgabe in 14 Bände, edited by Emil Dürr et al. (Stuttgart/Berlin/Leipzig: Deutsche Verlaganstalt, 1930-4).
  • Durkheim, Émile, Selected Writings, edited by Anthony Giddens (Cambridge (Cambridge University Press, 1972).
  • Gay, Peter, Style in History: Gibbon, Ranke, Macaulay, Burckhardt (New York /London: W.W. Norton, 1974).
  • Hartmann, Eduard von, Philosophie des UnbewusstenSpeculative Resultate nach inductiv-naturwissenschaftlicher Methode in 3 Bände (Leipzig: Kröner, 1923).
  • Janz, Curt Paul, Friedrich Nietzsche. Biographie in drei Bände (Munich: Carl Hanser, 1993).
  • Johnson, Dirk R., Nietzsche’s Anti-Darwinism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010).
  • Marx, Karl & Engels, Friedrich, The German Ideology, translated by S. Ryazanskaya (New York: Prometheus, 1998).
  • Richardson, John, Nietzsche's New Darwinism (New York/Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004).
  • Rickert, Heinrich, Science and History: Critique of Positivist Epistemology, translated by G. Reisman (New York: Van Nostrand, 1962).
  • Schopenhauer, Arthur, Zürcher Ausgabe. Werke in zehn Bände, edited by Hübscher et al. (Zürich: Diogenes Verlag, 1977).
  • Wilamowitz-Moellendorff, Ulirch von, “Future Philology! A Reply to Friedrich Nietzsche’s ‘The Birth of Tragedy’,” translated by Gertrude Postl et al., New Nietzsche Studies 4[1] (2000): 1-32.
  • Windelband, William, An Introduction to Philosophy, translated by J. McCabe (London: Unwin, 1921).
  • Windelband, William, “History and Natural Science,” translated by G. Oakes, History and Theory 19[2] (1980): 165-85.

b. Further Reading

  • Bahnsen, Julius, Zur Philosophie der Geschichte: Eine kritische Besprechung des Hegel-Hartmann’sche Evolutionismus aus Schopenhauer’schen Principien (Berlin: Duncker, 1872).
    • One of Nietzsche’s principle sources for both his criticism of teleology and his formulation of a naturalistic theory of historical explanation.
  • Benne, Christian, Nietzsche und die historisch-kritische Philologie (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2005)
    • Exposits and analyzes the way Nietzsche’s early philological training enters his mature philosophical thinking.
  • Bernoulli, Carl Albrecht, Das Dreigestirn: Bachofen, Jakob Burckhardt, Nietzsche (Basel: Schwabe & Co., 1931).
    • A reliable and comprehensive account of the personal and intellectual interrelations of these three Basel professors.
  • Blondel, Éric, The Body and Culture: Philosophy as Philological Genealogy, translated by Sean Hand (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1991).
    • Highly insightful attempt to assimilate Nietzsche’s philological training with a postmodern account of his perspectivism.
  • Born, Marcus Andreas, Nihilistisches Geschichtsdenken: Nietzsches perspektivische Genealogie (München: Wilhelm Fink, 2010).
    • A Foucault-influenced account of Nietzsche’s critique of Hegelian teleology and the historical ramifications of the death of God.
  • Brobjer, Thomas H. (2004): “Nietzsche’s View of the Value of Historical Studies and Methods” In: Journal of the History of Ideas. Bd. 65 (2), 301-22.
  • Brobjer, Thomas H., “Nietzsche’s Relation to Historical Methods and Nineteenth-Century German Historiography,” History and Theory 46 (2007): 155–79.
    • Both pieces by Brobjer present a wealth of information about Nietzsche’s historiographical context, reading, and influences.
  • Campioni, Guiliano, Paolo D’Iorio, Maria Cristina Fornari, Francesco Fronterotta & Andrea Orsucci (eds.) (2003): Nietzsches persönliche Bibliothek. Berlin (Walter de Gruyter Press).
    • A comprehensive collection of Nietzsche’s personal library, essential for reconstructing what Nietzsche read about history and historoical theory.
  • Cancik, Hubert, Nietzsches Antike: Vorlesung (Stuttgart: J.B. Metzler Verlag, 1995).
    • An examination of Nietzsche’s philological activities from one of the world’s leading historians of philology.
  • Dries, Manuel (ed.), Nietzsche on Time and History (Berlin: De Gruyter Press, 2008).
    • A fine collection of essays from leading and upcoming scholars, many of which address Nietzsche’s thinking about history.
  • Drossbach, Maximillian, Über scheinbaren und wirklichen Ursachen des Geschehens in der Welt (Halle: Pfeffer, 1884).
    • A naturalistic rejection of teleological historical explanation that Nietzsche read shortly before the composition of On the Genealogy of Morals.
  • Emden, Christian, Friedrich Nietzsche and the Politics of History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008).
    • A highly-informative contextualized account of Nietzsche’s historical theory, with special reference to the culture and politics of Basel during Nietzsche’s tenure.
  • Geuss, Raymond, “Nietzsche and Genealogy,” European Journal of Philosophy 2 (1994): 275–92.
    • An especially clear account of Nietzsche’s explanatory strategies in the Genealogy of Morals.
  • Gossman, Lionel, Basel in the Age of Burckhardt: A Study in Unseasonable Ideas (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000).
  • A foundational account of Nietzsche’s intellectual milieu in the 1860’s-70’s.
  • Hartmann, Eduard von, Philosophie des Unbewussten: Speculative Resultate nach inductiv-naturwissenschaftlicher Methode (Berlin: Carl Duncker, 1869).
    • One of Nietzsche’s most important sources of teleological historiography and the main target of his ire in the second Untimely Meditation.
  • Jensen, Anthony K., Nietzsche’s Philosophy of History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013).
    • A comprehensive account of Nietzsche’s historical theory and its shifts over the course of his career.
  • Jensen, Anthony K. & Heit, Helmut (eds.), Nietzsche as a Scholar of Antiquity (New York / London: Bloomsbury Publishing, 2014).
    • A collection of articles that covers the scope of Nietzsche’s publications and lecture notes during his time as a classical philologist.
  • Lipperheide, Christian, Nietzsches Geschichtsstrategien. Die rhetorische Neuorganisation der Geschichte (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1999).
    • A narrativist and constructivist reading of Nietzsche’s philosophy of history.
  • Meyer, Katrin, Ästhetik der Historie: Friedrich Nietzsches ‘vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben’ (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1998).
    • An analysis of the second Untimely Meditation from the perspective of Nietzsche’s aesthetic theory.
  • Nehamas, Alexander, “The Genealogy of Genealogy: Interpretation in Nietzsche’s Second Untimely Meditation and in On the Genealogy of Morals,” in Nietzsche, Genealogy, and Morality, edited by Richard Schacht (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1994), 269–83.
    • Considers Nietzsche’s genealogical mode of philosophizing as a more elaborate but nevertheless consistent expression of his earlier philological methodology.
  • Pletsch, Carl, Young Nietzsche: Becoming a Genius (New York: The Free Press, 1991).
    • An intellectual biography of Nietzsche’s early years, with special attention to his schooling and time at Basel.
  • Porter, James I., Nietzsche and the Philology of the Future (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000).
    • Remains the decisive account of Nietzsche’s philological study, articles, and lectures.
  • Reinhardt, Karl, “Nietzsche und die Geschichte,” in his Vermächtnis der Antike. Gesammelte Essays zur Philosophie und Geschichtsschreibung (Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1960), 296–309.
    • A dated, but still informative critique of Nietzsche’s contribution to philology from one of the leading classicists of the 20th Century.
  • Ritschl, Friedrich, Opuscula Philologica, 5 vols., edited by Kurt Wachsmuth (Leipzig: Teubner, 1879).
    • The badly-neglected collected works of Nietzsche’s teacher, containing, among many other things, observations and exhortations about the contemporary practice of classical philology as Nietzsche would have known them.
  • Saar, Martin, Genealogie als Kritik: Geschichte und Theorie des Subjekts nach Nietzsche und Foucault (Frankfurt/New York: Campus Verlag, 2007).
    • An admirable attempt to compare the historical theories of Foucault and Nietzsche from the standpoint of their respective notions of subjectivity.
  • Salaquarda, Jörg, “Studien zur Zweiten Unzeitgemäßen Betrachtung,” Nietzsche-Studien 13 (1984): 1–45.
    • The most comprehensive account of the genesis and context of the second Untimely Meditation in any language.
  • Schrift, Alan, Nietzsche and the Question of Interpretation: Between Hermeneutics and Deconstruction (New York/London: Routledge, 1990).
    • A decisive continental treatment of Nietzsche’s thinking generally, with special attention to Nietzsche’s theory of historical interpretation.
  • Sommer, Andreas Urs, Der Geist der Historie und das Ende des Christentums. Zur „Waffengenossenschaft“ von Friedrich Nietzsche und Franz Overbeck (Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 1997).
    • A highly-informed comparison of Nietzsche and the theological historian Franz Overbeck concerning especially teleology and Christian historiography.
  • Stambaugh, Joan, The Problem of Time in Nietzsche, translated by John F. Humphrey (Philadelphia: Bucknell University Press, 1987).
    • A seminal examination of the interrelation of history, temporality, subjectivity, and willing in Nietzsche.
  • White, Hayden, Metahistory: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-Century Europe (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1973).
    • Includes an attempt to read Nietzsche as a precursor to post-modern historical narrativity. White is one of the leading philosophers of history in the world.


Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
Providence College
U. S. A.

Lequyer (Lequier), Jules

Jules Lequyer (Lequier) (1814—1862)

LequyerLike Kierkegaard, Jules Lequyer (Luh-key-eh) resisted, with every philosophical and literary tool at his disposal, the monistic philosophies that attempt to weave human choice into the seamless cloth of the absolute. Although haunted by the suspicion that freedom is an illusion fostered by an ignorance of the causes working within us, he maintained that in whatever ways we are made—by God, the forces of nature, or the conventions of society—there remain frayed strands in the fabric of human existence where self-making adds to the process. Declaring this freedom “the first truth” required by all genuine inquiry into truth, he also challenged traditional doctrines of divine creativity, eternity, and omniscience and he developed his own alternative based on what he saw as the implications of a true metaphysics of freedom.

Lequyer was a reclusive Breton who died in relative obscurity without having published anything. He held no important academic post and most of his literary and philosophical work remained unfinished. Despite these disadvantages, his influence on philosophy was much greater than the ignorance of his thought and of his name would suggest. Charles Renouvier and William James adopted many of his ideas about the meaning of human freedom, its reality, and how it is known. Echoes of Lequyer’s ideas, and sometimes the very phrases he used, are found in French existentialism and American process philosophy. A man of deep religious conviction but also of increasingly melancholy temperament, Lequyer expressed his philosophy in a variety of literary styles. As a consequence, he has been called “the French Kierkegaard,” although he and his more famous Danish contemporary knew nothing of each other.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philosophy of Freedom
  3. Theological Applications
  4. Philosophical Legacy
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. English Translations
    3. Secondary Sources in French and English

1. Biography

Joseph-Louis-Jules Lequyer, born January 29, 1814 in the village of Quintin, France, was an only child. His father, Joseph Lequyer (1779-1837), was a respected physician, and his mother, Céleste-Reine-Marie-Eusèbe Digaultray (1772-1844), cared for the poor and sick in the Quintin hospital. The family name was subject to a variety of spellings, most notably, “Lequier” and “Lequyer” (occasionally with an accent aigu over the first e). Lequyer’s birth certificate had “Lequier” but in 1834 his father had the spelling legally fixed as “Lequyer” [Grenier, La Philosophie de Jules Lequier, 257-58]. Lequyer was not consistent in the way he spelled his name and the orthographic confusion persists in the scholarly literature. “Lequyer” is the spelling on the plaque marking his birthplace in Quintin and on his tombstone in Plérin.

Lequyer’s parents relocated from Quintin to the nearby town of St.-Brieuc along the north coast of Brittany where their son was educated in a little seminary. By the age of thirteen, he excelled in Greek and Latin. A pious Catholic upbringing, combined with his friendship with Louis Épivent (1805-1876), who himself became a cleric, nurtured Lequyer’s interests in philosophy and theology, especially the perennial question of human free will. The family spent vacations just north of St.-Brieuc near Plérin at an isolated cottage known as Plermont (a contraction of “Plérin” and “mont”) within walking distance of the coast. In this rural setting Lequyer spent many happy hours with his closest friend, Mathurin Le Gal La Salle (1814-1904). Another important attachment of his early years was Anne Deszille (1818-1909), also known as “Nanine.” Lequyer never married, although he twice proposed to Deszille (in 1851 and in 1861) and, to his great disappointment, she twice refused.

In 1834 Lequyer entered the École Polytechnique in Paris. The school regimen required students to rise at dawn, eat a meager breakfast, then study scientific subjects—mathematics, physics, and chemistry—until lunchtime. After lunch, there were military exercises, fencing, and horse riding, as well as lessons in dance and music. After supper, students retired to their studies until nightfall. The rigid schedule did not suit Lequyer’s contemplative habits so he was at cross purposes with some of his superiors. His troubles were exacerbated by the unexpected death of his father in 1837. The following year he failed the exam that would have qualified him to become a lieutenant. Viewing an offer to enter the infantry as an insult, he made a dramatic exit. He announced his resignation to the examining officer with these words: “My general, there are two types of justice, mine and yours” [Hémon, 145]. Of some interest is Lequyer’s physical description from his matriculation card: he stood just under five and a half feet, had blond hair, brown eyes, a straight nose, a small mouth, an oval face, a round chin, and scars under his left eye and on the right side of his chin [Brimmer 1975, Appendix III]. The scar on his chin was from a riding accident at the school which, in later years, he covered by wearing a beard.

The course of study in Paris introduced Lequyer to the determinism of Pierre Simon LaPlace (1749-1827). As the school’s military schedule had conflicted with his temperament, so the idea that every event is necessitated by its causes was in tension with his cherished religious ideas, in particular, the conviction of free will. By happy coincidence, he found in his new friend and classmate Charles Renouvier (1815-1903) a sounding board for his quandaries about freedom and necessity. Renouvier saw in Lequyer a strange combination of religious naïveté and philosophical profundity. Indeed, Renouvier never failed to acknowledge Lequyer’s genius and to refer to him—literally, to his dying days—as his “master” on the subject of free will [Derniers entretiens, 64]. Lequyer, chronically unable to complete most of what he wrote, benefited from Renouvier’s industry. Renouvier eventually published a small library of books, in some of which he included excerpts from Lequyer’s writing. Three years after his friend’s death Renouvier published, at his own expense, one-hundred and twenty copies of a handsome edition of his selection of Lequyer’s writings which he distributed free of charge to any interested party.

Upon leaving the École Polytechnique, Lequyer used the inheritance from his father to retire to Plermont where he lived with his mother and the family servant, Marianne Feuillet (probably born in 1792). Lequyer never had a head for finances, so his money was soon exhausted, although there remained properties in St.-Brieuc that his father had owned. In 1843, the three moved to Paris where Lequyer acquired a position teaching French composition to Egyptian nationals at the École Égyptienne. He had the misfortune of teaching at the school during its decline. Nevertheless, he worked to redesign its curriculum after the model of the École Polytechnique, but centered more on literature, poetry, and even opera. Lequyer’s mother died the year following the move to Paris. Worried over the state of her son’s mind, she entrusted him to the care of Feuillet with these words: “Oh, Marianne, keep watch over my poor Jules. He has in his heart a passion which, I greatly fear, will be the cause of his death” [Hémon, 172]. The exact object of his mother’s concern is unknown but in the fullness of time her words became prophetic.

On August 15, 1846, the day of celebration of the Assumption of Mary, Lequyer underwent a mystical experience that was occasioned by his meditations on the Passion of Christ. He wrote down his experience, alternating between French and Latin, which invites a comparison with Pascal’s Memorial. Lequyer’s indignation at those who caused Christ’s suffering is transformed, first, into a profound sense of repentance as he realizes that he too had “added some burden to the cross” by his sins, and, second, into the gratitude for the love of God in being forgiven his sins. On August 19th, the religious ecstasy recurred, this time as he took communion at the church of St.-Sulpice. Again, the theme of the suffering of Christ is paramount, but now giving way to a determination to share in those sufferings to such an extent that the Virgin Mary would be unable to distinguish him from her own son. Lequyer’s first biographer, Proper Hémon (1846-1918), spoke of the philosopher’s “bizarre religiosity” [Hémon, 184], but there can be no question that, despite his shortcomings and misfortunes, his mystical experiences found outlet in acts of devotion and charity for the remainder of his life.

Lequyer returned to Plermont with Feuillet in 1848, after the February revolution in Paris. Full of zeal for a rejuvenated Republic, he announced, with Renouvier’s help, his candidacy for a seat in the parliament of the Côtes-du-Nord as a “Catholic Republican” [Hémon, 188]. His published platform identifies freedom as the basis of rights and duties and it explicitly mentions the freedoms of the press, of association, of education, and of religion [Le Brech, 56-57]. Of note is that Lequyer received a glowing recommendation for political office from one of his former teachers at the École Polytechnique, Barthélémy Saint-Hilaire. However, like many in more rural areas who identified, or seemed to identify, with the Parisian revolutionaries, Lequyer was not elected. He came in twentieth on the list of candidates, receiving far too few votes to be among those who won a seat in the parliament.

After the election, which was in April 1848, Lequyer retired to Plermont and spent his days in study and meditation, which included long walks along the coast; sometimes he would stay out overnight. There was, however, the persistent problem of finances. Hémon reports that Lequyer would throw change wrapped in paper from his second floor study to the occasional beggar that passed by. From March 30, 1850 into 1851, he sold the family property in St.-Brieuc, leaving him only Plermont. When his aunt Digaultray died on March 31, 1850 he was hopeful of an inheritance of 10,000 francs. As luck would have it, the aunt’s will directed that the sum be doubled, but only on the condition that it be used to pay a debt of 20,000 francs that Lequyer owed to his first cousin, Palasme de Champeaux! The cousin died in August of the same year, so the inheritance went to his estate [Hémon, 245].

Lequyer’s letters to Renouvier indicate a heightened level of creativity in which he made major progress on his philosophical work. In a November 1850 letter, he claimed that he was writing “something unheard of,” namely that the first and most certain of truths is the declaration of one’s own freedom. This movement of thought ends with the idea that one is one’s own work, responsible to oneself, and “to God, who created me creator of myself” (Lequyer had written “creature of myself” but later changed it to “creator of myself”) [OC 70, 538]. Philosophical insights, however, were not enough to save Lequyer from the weight of his failed projects and his destitution which, arguably, contributed to a mental breakdown. On February 28, 1851, a neighbor found Lequyer wandering about with an axe with which he intended to cut his own arm; Lequyer was taken to the hospital in St.-Brieuc for observation. The doctors determined that he was a danger to himself and should be transferred to a mental institution. On March 3rd, Le Gal La Salle and the Abbot Cocheril took Lequyer to the asylum near Dinan, using subterfuge to lure him there. On April 12th, with the help of Paul Michelot (1817-1885) and some other friends, Lequyer was taken to Passy, near Paris, to the celebrated hospital-resort of Dr. Esprit Blanche, the well-known physician who specialized in mental disorders.

Lequyer was discharged from Passy on April 29th, improved but not completely recovered, according to the doctors. He returned to Plermont, there to be welcomed by the faithful Feuillet and to renew contact with an elderly neighbor, Madame Agathe Lando de Kervélégan (born 1790). Relations with others, however, were broken or became strained. Never accepting that his confinement was justified, he severed ties with Le Gal La Salle who he regarded as the one who had orchestrated it. In the book that he planned, a major section was labeled “Episode: Dinan.” Since the book was never completed, we cannot know Lequyer’s exact thoughts about his two months under medical supervision. That his perceptions were cloudy is indicated by the fact that, only a few months after his confinement, he proposed marriage to Nanine, believing she would accept. Her family, with a view to Lequyer’s mental and financial instability, encouraged her to refuse. This she did in a most forceful way by returning all of his letters and by instructing him to burn her letters to him. This he did, but not before making copies of certain excerpts.

For two years after the events of 1851 Lequyer’s whereabouts are unknown. His letters to Renouvier in the closing months of 1855 indicate that two years earlier he had gone to Besançon as a professor of mathematics at the Collège Saint-François Xavier. By Easter of 1854, however, relations with the head of the college, a Monsieur Besson, had gone sour. The details of the problem are unknown, but it seems that Besson scolded Lequyer for not coming to him to ask for something. According to Lequyer, Besson boasted that men of influence as great as the arch-bishop, “crawl at my feet” [OC 546]. Lequyer related this conversation to the Cardinal and Besson was demoted. One of Lequyer’s friends, Henri Deville, had written a well-intentioned letter to the Cardinal requesting that he find Lequyer another place in his diocese. The Cardinal, perhaps misinterpreting the request, turned against Lequyer. As a result, Lequyer was entangled in law suits with both Besson and the Cardinal over indemnities. Lequyer’s lawyer told him “all was lost” when he decided to act with dignity and not crawl at Besson’s feet [OC 549]. An interesting aspect of Lequyer’s sketchy account is that he says he was inspired by the memory of Dinan, imitating the man he had been there by controlling his anger in spite of the wrongs he perceived to have been done to him. Furthermore, he recognized Deville’s good intentions and, though he thought his intervention inappropriate, did not blame him for it.

By the close of 1855 Lequyer had returned to Plermont, never to leave again. Many of the most touching stories about Lequyer come from the last six years of his life. Though his relations with his friends were often strained, he inspired in them a seemingly unconditional loyalty. It was they after all who underwrote the considerable cost of staying at Passy. In his final years, his friends—including Le Gal La Salle who he had disowned—came to his aid more than once. For example, Lequyer frequented a restaurant in St.-Brieuc but would order embarrassingly meager portions. When the owner of the establishment told his friends, they instructed him to give Lequyer full meals and they would pay the difference. When the owner wondered whether Lequyer would notice the charity, the reply was, “Non, il est dans le ciel” [Hémon, 205]—his head is in the clouds—an apt metaphor for his impracticality and his philosophical preoccupations.

In 1858, on the recommendation of Madame Lando, Lequyer became the tutor of Jean-Louis Ollivier, the thirteen year old son of a customs officer of the same name who admired Lequyer’s rhetorical skills; the father once described Lequyer as “a magician of words” [Hémon, 191]. Lequyer taught young Ollivier but also employed him in transcribing Lequyer’s own writing into a more legible script. Ollivier studied with Lequyer for two years but at the close of 1860, passing the exam that allowed him the chance to study to become an administrator of the state, the boy left. A few months earlier (in April) Lequyer had the misfortune of losing a chance to become chief archivist for the Côtes-du-Nord because of a delay in mail service. With this opportunity missed and Ollivier gone, Lequyer was without his student and unemployed. Jean-Louis Le Hesnan, a man of twenty who was too frail to work in the fields took Olliver’s place as Lequyer’s secretary. This partnership, however, was not enough to lift the weight of loneliness.

In the year that followed, Lequyer’s condition deteriorated. His neighbors reported that he would lose track of time and come calling at late hours with no explanation. His hair and beard, no longer cared for, grew prematurely white. His gaze took on a lost and vacant stare. Lequyer’s quixotic hopes of marriage to Nanine were rekindled when, on December 28, 1861, her father died—he believed her father was the main obstacle to the marriage. He again proposed marriage; sometime in the first week of February he learned of her refusal, which she made clear was final. Lequyer’s behavior became frenzied and erratic. He was subject to bizarre hallucinations and he spoke of putting an end to his misery. On Tuesday, February 11, 1862, Lequyer went to the beach with Le Hesnan, shed his clothes, threw water on his chest, and jumped into the bay. He swam to the limits of his strength until he was visible only as a dot among the waves and he cried out. According to Le Hesnan, Lequyer’s last words would not have been a cry of distress but a farewell to Deszille—“Adieu Nanine” [Hémon, 232] At nine o’clock in the evening, Lequyer’s body washed ashore. Feuillet, who Lando described as Lequyer’s “second mother,” was waiting at Plermont to receive the body.

The official police report mentioned Lequyer’s “disturbed spirit” but ruled his death accidental. Nevertheless, a controversy erupted when a newspaper published a poem, “Les Adeiux de Jules Lequyer,” [The Farewells of Jules Lequyer] which was written in Lequyer’s voice and which suggested that he had committed suicide [Grenier, La Philosophie, 272]. Madame Lando eventually revealed herself as the author of the poem; she explained that she was saying Lequyer’s farewells for him in a way that he would have wished. The most propitious result of the controversy is that Charles Le Maoût, writing for Le Publicateur des Côtes-du-Nord (March 1, 1862), published an article titled “Derniers Moments de Jules Lequyer” [Last Moments of Jules Lequyer]. The article includes reports of Lequyer’s friends and neighbors about his final days, thereby providing insight into the disoriented and melancholy condition into which the philosopher had fallen. In November 1949, Dr. Yves Longuet, a psychiatrist at Nantes gave his professional opinion from the available evidence. He concluded that Lequyer suffered a “clear cyclopthemia,” that is to say, a manic-depressive personality [Grenier 1951, 37].

2. Philosophy of Freedom

Renouvier’s edition of Lequyer’s work, noted above, bore the title La Recherche d’une première vérité [The Search for a First Truth]. The book is divided into three sections. The first, titled Comment trouver, comment chercher une première vérité? [How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?], is prefaced by a brief quasi-autobiographical meditation, “La Feuille charmille” [The Hornbeam Leaf]. The second and third sections are, respectively, Probus ou le principe de la science: Dialogue [Probus or the Principle of Knowledge: Dialogue] and Abel et Abel—Esaü et Jacob: Récit biblique [Abel and Abel—Esau and Jacob: Biblical Narrative]. Collections edited by Jean Grenier in 1936 and 1952 brought together most of Lequyer’s extant work, including excerpts from his correspondence. Curiously absent from Grenier’s editions is a meditation on love and the Trinity; longer and shorter versions of this were published in subsequent collections (Abel et Abel 1991, pp. 101-08; La Recherche 1993, pp. 319-22). An unfinished short story from Lequyer’s earlier years titled La Fourche et la quenouille [The Fork and the Distaff] was published in 2010 and edited by Goulven Le Brech. Other collections have been published, but these form the corpus of Lequyer’s work.

“The Hornbeam Leaf” is Lequyer’s best known work. It was the one thing he wrote that he considered complete enough to distribute to his friends. It addresses, in the form of a childhood experience, the meaning and reality of freedom. Lequyer intended it to be the introduction to his work. It exhibits the best qualities of Lequyer’s writing in its dramatic setting, its poetic language, and its philosophical originality. Lequyer recalls one of his earliest memories as he played in his father’s garden. He is about to pluck a leaf from a hornbeam when he considers that he is the master of his action. Insignificant as it seems, the decision whether or not to pluck the leaf is in his power. He marvels at the idea that his act will initiate a chain of events that will make the world forever thereafter different than it might have been. As he reaches for the leaf, a bird in the foliage is startled. It takes flight only to be seized by a sparrow hawk. Recovering from the shock of this unintended consequence of his act, the child reflects on whether any other outcome was really possible. Perhaps the decision to reach for the leaf was one in a series of events in which each cause was itself the inevitable effect of a prior cause. Perhaps the belief that he could have chosen otherwise, that the course of events might have been different, is an illusion fostered by an ignorance of the antecedent factors bearing on the decision. The child is mesmerized by the thought that he might be unknowingly tangled in a web of necessity, but he recovers the faith in his freedom by a triumphant affirmation of his freedom.

Renouvier remarked that “The Hornbeam Leaf” recorded the point of departure of Lequyer’s philosophical effort [OC 3]. More than this, it illustrates the salient characteristics of freedom as Lequyer conceived them. For Lequyer, at a minimum, freedom involves the twin ideas that an agent’s decision is not a mere conduit through which the causal forces of nature operate and that it is itself the initiator of a chain of causes. Prior to the decision, the future opens onto alternate possibilities. The agent’s decision closes some of these possibilities while it opens others. After the decision is made, the feeling persists that one could have decided differently, and that the past would have been different because of the decision one might have made. Because the course of events is at least partially determined by the agent’s decision, Lequyer maintains that it creates something that, prior to the decision, existed only as a possibility. If one is free in this sense, then one is part creator of the world, and also of others. The child’s gesture leads to the bird’s death. Lequyer draws the corollary that the smallest of beginnings can have the greatest of effects that are unforeseen by the one who initiated the causal chain, a thought that makes even the least of decisions potentially momentous [OC 14, compare OC 201]. This is Lequyer’s version of what Edward Lorenz much later, and in a different context, dubbed “the butterfly effect”—a butterfly flaps its wings in Brazil which leads to a tornado in Texas.

For Lequyer, one’s decisions not only create something in the world, they double back on oneself. If one is free then, in some respects, one is self-creative. These ideas are expressed cryptically in Lequyer’s maxim which occurs in the closing pages of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?: “TO MAKE, not to become, but to make, and, in making, TO MAKE ONESELF” [OC 71]. When Lequyer denies that making is a form of becoming he is saying that the free act is not a law-like consequence of prior conditions. This is not to say that making or self-making is wholly independent of prior conditions. Lequyer borrows the language of Johann Fichte and speaks of the human person as a “dependent independence” [OC 70; compare OC 441]. Lequyer is clear that one is not responsible for having come to exist nor for all the factors of nature and nurture that brought one to the point of being capable of thinking for oneself and making one’s own decisions. All of these are aspects of one’s dependence and Lequyer often underscores their importance. On the other hand, one’s independence, as fragile and seemingly insignificant as it may be, is the measure of one’s freedom. This freedom, moreover, is the essential factor in one’s self-making. For Lequyer, it makes sense not only to speak of one’s decisions as being expressions of one’s character as so far formed, but also to speak of one’s character as an expression of one’s decisions as so far made.

Lequyer considers the objection that his view of freedom involves “a sort of madness of the will” [OC 54; compare OC 381]; by claiming that the free act, like a role of dice, could go one way or another, Lequyer seems to imply that freedom is only randomness, a “liberty of indifference” undisciplined by reason. Lequyer replies that arbitrariness is indeed not the idea of freedom, but he claims that it is its foundation. In Lequyer’s view, one is oneself the author of the chance event and that event is one’s very decision. His meaning seems to be that indeterminism—the idea that, in some instances, a single set of causal factors is compatible with more than one possible effect—is a necessary but not a sufficient condition of acts for which we hold a person accountable. In the process of deliberation, motives are noticed and reasons are weighed until one decides for one course of action over another. The will is manifested in the sphere of one’s thought when one causes one idea to prevail over others and one’s hesitation is brought to an end. The act resulting in a decision may be characterized in any number of ways—capricious, selfish, reasonable, moral—but it is in no sense a product of mere brute force. The entire process of deliberation, Lequyer says, is animated by the self-determination of the will. Should an explanation be demanded, appealing to antecedent conditions for exactly why the decision was made one way rather than another, Lequyer replies that the demand is question-begging, for it presupposes determinism [OC 47]. The free act is not a mere link in a causal chain; it is at the origin of such chains. In Lequyer’s words, “To act is to begin” [OC 43].

It is clear that Lequyer did not believe that freedom and determinism can both be true. He acknowledged that we often act, without coercion, in accordance with our desires. Lequyer says that “the inner feeling”—presumably, introspectively discerned—guarantees it [OC 50]. Some philosophers look no further than this for a definition of freedom. For Lequyer, however, this is not enough, for non-human animals often act without constraint [OC 334, 484]. To speak of free will one must also include the idea that one is the ultimate author of one’s decisions. He counsels not to confuse the lack of a feeling of dependence upon causal conditions that would necessitate one’s decision with the feeling of independence of such conditions. The confusion of these ideas, Lequyer claims, leads us to believe that we have more freedom than we actually have. All that we are allowed to say, based on introspection, is that we sometimes do not feel necessitated by past events. An analogous argument for determinism is likewise inconclusive. When we come to believe through a careful examination of a past decision that causes were at work of which we were unaware and which strongly suggest that the decision was inevitable, we are not warranted in generalizing to all of our decisions, supposing that none of them are free [OC 50].

In the dramatic finale of “The Hornbeam Leaf” the child affirms his own freedom. This affirmation is not based on an argument in the sense of inferring a conclusion from premises that are more evident than freedom itself. Lequyer reaches a theoretical impasse—an aporia—on the question of freedom and necessity. Somewhat anticipating Freud, he never tires of emphasizing the depth of our ignorance about the ultimate causes of our decisions. Indeed, the final sentence of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? cautions that we never know whether a given act is free [OC 75]. Moreover, he denies that we experience freedom [OC 52; compare OC 349, 353]. He argues that this would involve the impossibility of living through the same choice twice over and experiencing the decision being made first in one way and then being made in the contrary way. The memory of the first choice—or at least the mere fact of its having taken place—would intrude on the second and thus it would not be the same choice in identical circumstances. Lequyer speaks, rather, of a “presentiment” of freedom, the stubbornly persistent sense that we have that, in a given circumstance, we could have chosen differently [OC 52]. Yet, Lequyer maintains, such is the extent of our ignorance—our lack of self-knowledge—that it is often easier to believe that one is free when one is not than to believe that one is free when one really is [OC 53].

Notwithstanding Lequyer’s many caveats about the limitations on freedom and even of knowing whether free will exists, he is above all a champion of human liberty. What remains to be explained is the ground of this affirmation. Despite the fragmentary nature of his literary remains, the general outline of his thinking is clear. How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? begins as a Cartesian search for an indubitable first truth but it diverges from Descartes’ project in being more than a theoretical exercise. Lequyer speaks of the “formidable difficulty” that stands in the way of inquiry: if one seeks truth without prejudice one runs the risk of changing one’s most cherished convictions [OC 32]. He uses a Pascalian image to illustrate the attempt to seek truth without risk of losing one’s convictions. He says that it would be like walking along a road imagining a precipice on either side; something would be missing from the experience, “the precipice and the vertigo.” Lequyer continues in Pascal’s vein by raising the possibility that honest investigation may not support one’s faith. The heart can place itself above reason but what one most desires is that faith and reason be in harmony [OC 33]. There is, finally, the difficulty that sincere doubt is “both impossible and necessary from different points of view” [OC 30]. It is impossible because doubting what is evident (for example, that there is a world independent of one’s mind) is merely feigned doubt; it is necessary because one cannot assume that what is evident is true (for example, even necessary truths may seem false and people have genuine disagreements about what they firmly believe), otherwise, the search for truth would never begin.

Lequyer’s differences with Descartes are also apparent in his treatment of the skeptical argument from dreaming: because dreams can feel as real as waking life, one cannot be certain that one is awake. Lequyer notes that the search for a first truth requires a sustained effort of concentration in which one actively directs one’s thoughts. In dreams, impressions come pell-mell and one is more a spectator of fantastic worlds than an actor sustaining one’s own thoughts. Lequyer concedes that he cannot be certain that he is awake, but he can be certain that he does not inhabit any ordinary dream. If one sleeps it is one’s thoughts that one doubts; if one is awake, it is one’s memory that one doubts [OC 36]. Lequyer avers that the former is a less feigned doubt than the latter. Pushed further by the radical skepticism to justify one’s belief in the external world, Lequyer prefers the answer of the child: “Just because” [OC 37]. His discussion takes a decidedly existential detour as he reflects on the solitude implicit in the impossibility of directly knowing the thoughts of another. Lequyer’s is not the academic worry of Descartes of how we know that another person is not a mere automaton, it is rather the sense of isolation in contemplating the gulf between two minds even when there is the sincere desire on both of their parts to communicate [OC 37].

It is Lequyer’s treatment of the cogito (“I think”) that takes one to the heart of his philosophy of freedom. He acknowledges the certainty of Descartes’ “I think therefore I am” but he criticizes his predecessor for leaving the insight obscure and therefore of not making proper use of it [OC 329]. The obscurity, Lequyer says, is in the concept of a self-identical thinking substance—sum res cogitans. The cogito is precisely the activity of a thinking subject having itself as an object of thought. In the language of the phenomenologists, Lequyer is puzzled by the intentionality within self-consciousness—the mind representing itself to itself [compare OC 362]. He argues that there is an essentially temporal structure to this relation; the “self” of which one is aware in self-awareness is a previous state of oneself. Lequyer goes so far as to call consciousness “nascent memory” [OC 339-40]. This is a significant departure from Descartes who does not even include memory in his list of characteristics of thought. Descartes says that by “thought” he means understanding, willing, sensing, feeling, and imagining (abstaining by methodical doubt, to be sure, from any judgment about the reality of the object of one’s thought). The omission of “remembering” is curious; “I (seem to) remember, therefore I am” is an instance of the cogito and memory is not obviously reducible to any of the other characteristics of thought. Although Lequyer does not claim that self-memory is perfect, he maintains that each aspect of self-consciousness—as subject and as object—requires the other. Their unity, he maintains, is nothing other than the activity of unifying subject and object. Furthermore, the on-going sequence of events that is consciousness requires that each emergent “me” becomes an object remembered by a subsequent “me.” The “Hornbeam Leaf” is itself the report of such an act of remembering.

For Lequyer, the analysis of the “I think” reveals a more fundamental fact, to wit, “I make.” The making, moreover, is a self-making, for one is continually unifying the dual and interdependent aspects of oneself as subject and as object [OC 329]. Because this process of self-formation is not deterministic, it is open-ended. Lequyer characterizes the relation of cause and effect in a free act as asymmetrical. He labels the relation from effect (subject) to cause (object) as “the necessary” because the subject would not be what it is apart from the object that it incorporates into self-awareness; however, he labels the relation from cause (object) to effect (subject) as “the possible” in the sense that the object remains what it is independent of the subject incorporating it. Lequyer says that “the effect is the movement by which the cause determines itself” [OC 473]. Lequyer’s asymmetrical view of causation, at least where the free act is concerned, diverges from that of the determinist. In deterministic thinking, necessity flows symmetrically from cause to effect and from effect to cause; “the possible,” for determinism, is only a product of our ignorance of the causal matrix that produces an effect. Lequyer agrees that ignorance is a factor in our talk of possibility. He notes that the hand that opens a letter that contains happy or fatal news still trembles, hoping for the best and fearing the worst, each “possibility” considered, although one knows that one of the imagined outcomes is now impossible [OC 60]. Lequyer’s indeterminism, on the other hand, allows that possibilities outrun necessities, that the future is sometimes open whether or not we are ignorant of causes.

Lequyer writes that “it is an act of freedom which affirms freedom” [OC 67]. As already noted, for Lequyer, free will is not deduced from premises whose truth is more certain than the conclusion. We have also seen that he denies that free will can be known directly in experience [OC 353]. The logical possibility remains—entertained by the child in “The Hornbeam Leaf” and spelled out in greater detail in the fourth part of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?—that free will is an illusion, that one’s every thought and act is necessitated by the already completed course of events reaching into the past before one’s birth. Lequyer addresses the impasse between free will and determinism with the following reasoning (Renouvier called this Lequyer’s double dilemma). Either free will or determinism is true, but which one is true is not evident. Lequyer says that one must choose one or the other by means of one or the other. This yields a four-fold array: (1) one chooses freedom freely; (2) one chooses freedom necessarily; (3) one chooses necessity freely; (4) one chooses necessity necessarily [OC 398; compare Renouvier’s summary, OC 64-65]. One’s affirmation should at least be consistent with the truth, which means that the array reduces to the first and last options. Of course, the determinist believes that the second option characterizes the advocate of free will; by parity of reasoning, the free willist believes that the third option characterizes the determinist. Again, there is stalemate.

Inspired by the example of mathematics, Lequyer proposes to break the deadlock by considering “a maximum and a minimum at the same time, the least expense of belief for the greatest result” [OC 64, 368]. He compares the hypotheses of free will and determinism as postulates for how they might make sense of or fail to make sense of human decisions. Lequyer, it should be noted, conceives the non-human world of nature as deterministic, so his discussion of free will is limited to the human realm and, in his theology, to that of the divine [OC 475]. It is in considering the two postulates, according to Lequyer, that the specter of determinism casts its darkest shadow. First, with Kant, Lequyer accepts that free will is a necessary postulate to make sense of the moral life [OC 345; compare OC 484-85]. If no one could have chosen otherwise than they chose, there is no basis for claiming that they should have chosen otherwise; judgments of praise and blame, especially of past actions, are groundless if determinism is true. Second, Lequyer goes beyond Kant by claiming that free will is necessary for making sense of the search for truth [OC 398-400]. Lequyer’s reasoning is not as clear as one would like, but the argument seems to be as follows. The search for truth presupposes that the mind can evaluate the reasons for and against a given proposition. The mechanisms of determinism are not, however, sensitive to reasons; indeed, no remotely plausible deterministic laws have been found or proposed for understanding intellectual inquiry. Renouvier elaborated this point by saying that, as the freedom of indifference involves (as Lequyer says) an active indifference to reasons, so determinism involves a passive indifference to reasons. Thus, determinism, by positing necessity as the explanation for our reasoned judgments, undermines the mind’s sensitivity to reasons and therefore allows no way clear of skepticism.

Lequyer’s reasoning, even if it is sound, does not decide the issue in favor of free will. Nor does Lequyer claim that it does. Determinism may yet be true and, if Lequyer is correct, the consequences are that morality is founded on a fiction and we can have no more trust in our judgments of truth and falsity than we can have in a random assignment of truth values to propositions. In the final analysis, the truth that Lequyer seeks is less a truth that is discovered than it is a truth that is made. The free act affirms itself, but because the act is self-creative, it is also a case of the act creating a new truth, namely, that such and such individual affirmed freedom. If freedom is true, and if Lequyer’s reasoning is correct, then the one who creates this fact has the virtue of being able to live a life consistent with moral ideals and of having some hope of discovering truth.

3. Theological Applications

Renouvier deemphasized the theological dimensions of Lequyer’s thought. He said he was bored by Lequyer’s views on the Trinity. He suggested demythologizing Lequyer’s religious ideas so as to salvage philosophical kernels from the theological husk in which they were encased. Obviously, Lequyer did not agree with this approach. Indeed, he devoted approximately twice as much space in his work to topics in philosophy of religion and Christian theology as he did to strictly non-religious philosophizing. Grenier convincingly argued that Lequyer’s design was a renewal of Christian philosophy [OC 326]. One may, however, sympathize with Renouvier’s concerns, for a few of Lequyer’s ruminations are now dated. He seemed to have no knowledge of the sciences that, in his own day, were revealing the astounding age of the earth and the universe. Adam and Eve were real characters in his mind and he speculated on Christ’s return in a few years because of the symmetry between the supposed two-thousand year interval from the moment of creation until the time of Christ and the fact that nearly two-thousand more years had elapsed since Jesus walked the earth [OC 439-40]. Despite these limitations Lequyer’s treatment of religious themes is not, for the most part, dependent on outdated science. His views prefigure developments in philosophical theology in the century and a half since his death, giving his thought a surprisingly contemporary flavor.

Lequyer’s more explicitly theological works are as notable for their literary qualities as for their philosophical arguments. Probus or the Principle of Knowledge, also known as the Dialogue of the Predestinate and the Reprobate, is a nearly complete work in three parts. The first section is a dialogue between two clerics who have been made privy to the future by means of a tableau that pictures for them the contents of divine foreknowledge. Neither character is named, but one is sincerely faithful while the other exhibits only a superficial piety. They see in the tableau that the hypocritical cleric will repent and enter heaven but the pious cleric will backslide and live with the demons. When “the reprobate” begins to despair, “the predestinate” tries to offer him hope of going to heaven. Hope comes in the form of arguments from medieval theologians that are designed to show the compatibility of God’s foreknowledge and human freedom. In the style of Scholastic quaestiones disputatae, the clerics debate the classical arguments. The pious cleric criticizes and is unconvinced by each argument. In the second part, the impious cleric appeals to the tableau for events occurring twenty years in the future. The pious cleric has become a master in a monastery and, ironically, has become a partisan of the very arguments that he had earlier criticized. In the future scene, the master monitors and eventually enters a Socratic discussion between Probus, a young divine, and Caliste, a child. Probus defends the idea that God faces a partially open future precisely because God is perfect and must know, and therefore be affected by, what the creatures do. The scene closes as the master counters these arguments with the claim that the future is indeterminate for human perception but determinate for God. The final and shortest section returns to the clerics. The reprobate’s closing speech answers through bitter parodies the ideas that he has just heard uttered by his future self, the master. The speech reveals that the clerics are having dreams that will be mostly forgotten when they awake. The drama closes when they wake up, each remembering only the end of his dream: one singing with the angels, the other in agony with the demons. Satan, who appears for the first time, has the final word. He will lie in wait for one of the men to stumble.

The dialogue is operatic in its intricacy and drama; its philosophical argument is complex and rigorous. The intertwining of its literary and philosophical aspects is evident in the final pages when the clerics are made to forget the content of their shared dream. They must forget their dream in order for the revelation of the dream to come to pass without interference from the revelation itself. Likewise, Satan is not privy to the content of the dreams, so he must lie in wait, not knowing whether he will catch his prey. It is clear both from the tone of the dialogue and from other things that Lequyer wrote that the reprobate in the first and third parts and Probus in the second part are his spokespersons. The overall message of the dialogue is that the position on divine knowledge and human freedom that had been mapped out by Church theologians is nightmarish. Reform in both the meaning of freedom and how this affects ideas about God are in order. In short, the dialogue is a good example of Lequyer’s attempt to renew Christian philosophy. It should be said, however, that specifically Christian (and Jewish) ideas are used primarily by way of illustration and thus, it is less Christian philosophy than it is philosophical theology that is under consideration.

Lequyer was conversant with what most of the great theologians said about the foreknowledge puzzle—from Augustine and Boethius to Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, and John Duns Scotus. The concluding fragments of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? make clear that he rejected the Thomistic claim that the creatures can have no affect on God. The relation from the creatures to God, says Lequyer, is as real as the relation from God to the creatures [OC 73]. This rejection of Thomism follows from his analysis of freedom as a creative act that initiates causal chains. One’s free acts make the world, other persons, and even oneself, different than they otherwise would have been. Lequyer never doubted that God is the author of the universe, but the universe, he emphasized, includes free creatures. Thus, he speaks of “God, who created me creator of myself” [OC 70]. Aquinas explained that, in the proper sense of the word, creativity belongs to God alone; the creatures cannot create. For Lequyer, on the other hand, God has created creatures that are lesser creators. That they are God’s creation entails that they are dependent upon God, but since they are also creative they are in some measure independent of God. Because the acts of a free creature produce novel realities, they also create novel realities for God. In a striking turn of phrase, Lequyer says that the free acts of the creatures “make a spot in the absolute, which destroys the absolute” [OC 74].

Lequyer never doubts the omniscience of God. What is in doubt is what there is for God to know and how God comes by this knowledge. The dominant answers to these questions, expressed most thoroughly by Aquinas, were that God has detailed knowledge of the entire sweep of events in space and time—all that has been, is, and will be—and this knowledge is grounded in the fact that God created the universe. The deity has perfect self-knowledge and, as the cause of the world, knows the world as its effect. God’s creativity, according to the classical theory, has no temporal location, nor is omniscience hampered by time. Divine eternity, in the seminal statement of Boethius, is the whole, complete, simultaneous possession of endless life [compare OC 423]. Lequyer’s theory of free will challenges Aquinas’ view of the mechanics of omniscience. On Lequyer’s view, God cannot know human creative acts by virtue of creating them. To be sure, the ability to perform such acts is granted by God, but the acts themselves are products of the humans that make them and are not God’s doing. These lesser creative acts are the necessary condition of God’s knowledge of them; they create something in God that God could not know apart from their creativity. Their creative choices, moreover, are not re-enactments in time of what God decided for them in eternity, nor do they exist in eternity [OC 212]. It follows that they cannot be present to God in eternity. If it is a question of the free act of a creature, what is present to God is that such and such a person is undecided between courses of action and that both are equally possible. God too faces an open future precisely because more than one future is open to a creature to help create. In Lequyer’s words, “A frightful prodigy: man deliberates, and God waits!” [OC 71].

It is tempting to say that Lequyer offers a view of divine knowledge as limited. Lequyer demurs. As Probus explains, it is no more a limitation on God’s knowledge not to be able to know a future free act than it is a limitation on God’s power not to be able to create a square circle—the one is as impossible as the other [OC 171]. A future free act is, by its nature, indeterminate and must be known as such, even by God. Lequyer counsels that his view of divine knowledge only seems to be a limitation on God because we have an incorrect view of creativity. Prefiguring Henri Bergson, he speaks of the “magic in the view of accomplished deeds” that makes them appear, in retrospect, as though they were going to happen all along [OC 280; compare OC 419]. Lequyer—through Probus—speaks of divine self-limitation, but this is arguably an infelicitous way for him to make his case [OC 171]. It is not as though God could remove blinders or exert a little more power and achieve the knowledge of an as yet to be enacted free decision. Prior to the free decision, there is nothing more to be known than possibilities (and probabilities); by exerting more power, God could deprive the decision of its freedom, but it would, by the nature of the case, no longer be a free decision that God was foreseeing. Lequyer argues, however, that one may freely set in motion a series of events that make it impossible for one’s future self to accomplish some desired end. In that case, it would have been impossible for God to foreknow the original free decision, but God would infallibly know the result once the decision had been made.

Lequyer does not tire of stressing that if God is omniscient, then God must know the extent to which the future is open at any given juncture [OC 205]. Recall that Lequyer is mindful of how easily we fool ourselves into thinking we are free when we are not. We mistake merely imagined possibilities for real possibilities. God is not subject to this limitation. For these reasons, his view of divine creativity and knowledge allows for a significant degree of providential control, although there can be no absolute guarantees that everything God might wish to occur will occur. Risk remains. Lequyer disparages the idea that every detail of the world is willed by God; this view of divine power, he says, yields “imitations of life” that make of the work of God something frivolous [OC 212]. Even if creatures are ignorant of the extent of their freedom, free will is nonetheless real and so the world is no puppet show. When it comes to the question of prophecy, Lequyer emphasizes how often biblical prophecies are warnings rather than predictions. Those involving predictions, especially of free acts (for example, Peter’s denials of Christ and Judas’ betrayal), can be accounted for, he avers, by highlighting human ignorance and pride in comparison with divine knowledge of the extent to which the future is open [compare OC 206-07]. God is able to see into the heart of a person to know perfectly what is still open for the person not to do and what is certain that he or she will do. On Lequyer’s view, a deed for which a person is held accountable must be free in its origin but not necessarily in its consequences. One may freely make decisions that deprive one’s future self of freedom, but this does not relieve the person of moral accountability [OC 211].

A peculiarity of Lequyer’s theory as it appears in Probus is that he denies the law of non-contradiction where future contingents are concerned. In this, he follows what he understood (and what some commentators understand) to be Aristotle’s views. Lequyer claims that it is true to say of things past or present that they either are or they are not. On the other hand, for future contingents (like free decisions that might go one way or another), Lequyer says that both are false; where A is a future contingent, both A-will-be and A-will-not-be are false [OC 194]. Doubtless this is the least plausible aspect of Lequyer’s views since abandoning the law of non-contradiction is an extremely heavy price to pay for an open future. It is interesting to speculate, however, on what he would have thought of Charles Hartshorne’s view that the contradictory of A-will-be is A-may-not-be and the contradictory of A-will-not-be is A-may-be. This makes A-will-be and A-will-not-be contraries rather than contradictories. As in Aristotle’s square, contraries may both be false; in this way, Lequyer could have achieved at no damage to elementary logic a doctrine of an open future. He certainly leaned in this direction in the closing pages of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? There, he declares that it is contradictory to say that a thing will be and that it is entirely possible that it may not be [OC 75].

Besides Probus, the curiously titled Abel and Abel—Esau and Jacob: Biblical Narrative is Lequyer’s other major work that addresses specifically religious themes. As the title suggests, it is closely tied to biblical motifs. Although it is yet another exploration of the idea of freedom, the examination of philosophical arguments is replaced by a fiction informed by philosophical ideas. Lequyer imagines an old man of Judea, living a little after the time of Christ, who has quoted St. Paul to his grandson that God preferred Jacob to Esau before their birth (Romans 9.11). The child is astonished and saddened by the statement, because it seems to place God’s goodness in doubt. The old man tells a story to the child that is designed to help explain the enigma. The tale, set some generations after Jacob and Esau, concerns the identical twin sons—identical even in their names, “Abel”—of a widowed patriarch, Aram. Before telling this story, however, he recounts the biblical episode of Abraham’s attempted sacrifice of Isaac (Gen. 22). He explains that he wishes the grandson to be reminded of Isaac under Abraham’s knife when he tells the story of the Abels, saying, “Faith is a victory; for a great victory, there must be a great conflict” [OC 235]. In the epilogue, the wizened grandfather gives what amounts to a Christian midrash on the story of Jacob and Esau with special attention to Jacob’s wrestling with the angel (Gen. 32.24-32). Thus, the story of the Abel twins is intercalated between two biblical stories. The theme uniting the three stories is God’s tests and the possible responses to them.

The Abel twins are as alike as twins could be, sharing thoughts and sometimes even dreams, but always in bonds of love for one another. They are introduced to an apparent injustice that saddens them when two brothers, slaves of their father, commit a theft and Aram pardons one but punishes the other. The seeming unfairness of the slave’s punishment reminds the twins of Esau’s complaint that he had been cheated when his brother Jacob stole their father’s blessing from him (Gen. 27). The Abels come close to passing judgment on their own father for treating the guilty slaves unequally. They resist the thought and then are told by Eliezer, the senior servant in the household, that Aram recognized the slave he condemned as having led his companions into some misdeed prior to having committed the theft. The boys are relieved to hear their father vindicated. His judgment of the slaves only seemed unjust to the twins because they lacked information that their father possessed. The episode of the unequally treated thieves serves as a parable counseling faith in the justice of God even when God seems to act in morally arbitrary ways.

The twins themselves must also face the test of being treated unequally. Aram shows them an elaborately decorated cedar ark. He explains that the day will come when one of the twins will be favored over the other to open the ark and discover inside the name which God reserves for him and his brother. Mysteriously, the name will apply to both of them but it will separate them as well. The dreams of the twins are disturbed by this favor that will separate them. Aram leaves, perhaps never to return again, giving charge of his sons to Eliezer. After a time, Eliezer brings the boys again to the cedar ark and there explains to them the decree of Aram. The favored son will be given a ring to denote that he is the chosen of God. The other son may either submit to his brother or depart from the country with a third of Aram’s inheritance, leaving the other two-thirds of the wealth for the chosen Abel. Their father’s possessions are great, so to receive a third of the inheritance is a significant amount. Nevertheless, the fact remains that the twins, equal in every way, will have been treated unequally by Aram’s decree.

It is not given to the child who is being told the story of the Abel twins (or to the reader) to know the outcome of their trial. Instead, he is told of three mutually exclusive ways in which the story could go, depending on how the brothers respond to their unequal treatment. In the first scenario, the favored Abel succumbs to pride and his brother shows resentment. Calling to mind the name of the first murderer in the Bible, Lequyer writes, “And, behind the sons of Aram, Satan who was promising himself two Cains from these two Abels, was laughing” [OC 265]. In the second scenario, the favored brother refuses the gift out of a generous feeling for his brother. In that case, Lequyer says that the favored Abel can be called “the Invincible.” In the third scenario, the favored brother, in great sorrow for what his brother has not received, accepts the ring while the other Abel, out of love for his twin, rejoices in his brother’s gift and helps him to open the gilded cedar chest. Lequyer says that, in this case, the other Abel can be called “the Victorious.” Lequyer presents the three scenarios in the order in which he believes they ought to be valued, from the least (the first scenario) to the greatest (the third scenario). When the ark is opened the mystery is revealed of the single name that is given to the brothers that nevertheless distinguishes them. Written within are the words: YOUR NAME IS: THAT WHICH YOU WERE IN THE TEST [OC 276]. The test was to see how the twins would respond to the apparent injustice of one being favored over the other. In effect, God’s predestined name for the brothers is like a mathematical variable whose value will be determined by the choices that the brothers make in response to the test.

Lequyer is clear that the lesson of Abel and Abel is not simply that God respects the free will of the twins. One also learns that God’s richer gifts may be more in what is denied than in what is given [OC 271]. Put somewhat differently, the denial of a gift may itself be a gift of an opportunity to exercise one’s freedom in the best possible way. To be sure, the favored Abel has his own opportunities. By accepting the ring, graciously and without pride, he is a noble figure. He is greater still (“the Invincible”) if he refuses the ring out of love for his brother. It is open to the other Abel, however, to win an incomparable victory (signified by the name, “the Victorious”) should his brother accept the ring. He is victorious over the apparent injustice done to him and over the resentment and envy he might have felt. He has been given a great opportunity to exhibit a higher virtue and he has taken it. In Lequyer’s words, “It is sweet to be loved . . . but it is far sweeter to love” [OC 272]; he argues that one can be loved without finding pleasure in it, although this may be a fault, but one cannot love without feeling joy. It should also be noted that by becoming “the Victorious” the other Abel in no way diminishes the virtue or the reward open to his twin. In this way, Lequyer avers, one may go far in vindicating God’s justice as well as God’s magnificence (that is, giving more to a person than is strictly merited by their deeds). This is a long way from a complete theodicy but Lequyer surely meant these reflections to be an important contribution to a renewal of Christian philosophy.

In the epilogue Lequyer reemphasizes the importance of accepting the will of God even when it seems harsh. The grandfather returns to the story of Jacob and Esau whose unequal treatment so saddened the grandson in the first place. According to the grandfather’s imaginative retelling, Jacob was tested by God when he wrestled with the angel. As Jacob anxiously awaits the arrival of Esau who had vowed to kill him (Gen. 27.41), he is filled with terror contemplating “the stubbornness of the Lord’s goodwill” in allowing him to buy Esau’s birthright (Gen. 25.29-33) and to steal Isaac’s blessing [OC 296]. Perhaps he fears that Esau will finally exact God’s judgment against him. A stranger approaches Jacob from the shadows and demands to know whether he will bless the name of God even if God should strike him. Jacob promises to bless God. He is shown several terrifying episodes in his future, from the rape of his daughter Dinah (Gen. 34.1-5) to the presumed death of his son Joseph (Gen. 37.33). In the final vision, a perfectly righteous man he does not recognize suffers an ignominious death on a cross. After each vision, Jacob “wrestles” with the temptation to impiety but instead blesses God’s name. Jacob is thus found worthy of the favors bestowed upon him. As the stranger leaves, Jacob sees his face and recognizes it as the face of the man on the cross. When morning comes, Esau arrives and greets his brother with kisses of fraternal love (Gen. 33.4).

Probus and Abel and Abel address different problems and in very different styles. Yet, in some sense they are a diptych, to borrow the apt metaphor of André Clair. Each work deals with a different kind of necessity. The necessity in Probus (also in How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth?) is that of deterministic causes resulting inevitably in certain effects, included among the latter, one’s supposedly free decisions. The necessity in Abel and Abel is the inalterability of the past, especially as it pertains to Aram’s decree. The decree sets the conditions of the test but does not determine its outcome. This is very different from the decree of damnation of the unhappy cleric. The tableau of God’s foreknowledge includes every detail of how the cleric will act in the future. In the dialogue, there is no equivalent of the “name” that is written in the cedar ark, no variable whose value can be decided by one’s free choice. Indeed, Probus can be read as an extended reductio against traditional teachings about foreknowledge and predestination. The predestinate fails to console the reprobate. There can be no hope for him for he knows with certainty that he will be damned. The dialogue, however, offers hope for the reader, the hope of breaking free of a nightmarish theology by rethinking the concepts of freedom and the nature of God along the lines that the character of Probus suggests—after all, Probus is the name of the dialogue. Abel and Abel reinforces the idea that God faces a relatively open future. The story does not tell which of the three options is chosen, nor does it suggest that one of them is predestined to occur.

The story of the Abel twins goes beyond the dialogue, however, by returning to the question raised in How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? of how self-identity is constructed. Clair argues convincingly that Lequyer means to generalize from the Abel twins to all human beings. The twins represent the fact that one’s self-identity is not merely a question of not being someone else. They are different from each other but neither acquires a new “name”—that is, a distinctive identity—apart from exercising their freedom in response to the test. This is consistent with Lequyer’s theme of the self as a product of self-creative acts, although the self-creativity of the twins most clearly manifests itself in relation to other persons. In Abel and Abel, there is a shift in the question of self-creativity from metaphysics to axiology. The fulfillment of self-creativity, which is to say its highest manifestation, is in love. The “I” of self-creativity becomes inseparable from the “we”. Lequyer appropriates this idea for theology in his reflections on the Trinity. He says that a Divine Love that cannot say “You” to one that is equal to itself would be inconsolable by the eternal absence of its object [Abel et Abel 1991, 101]. If God is love, as Christianity maintains (I John 4.8), then the unity of God requires a plurality within the Godhead.

4. Philosophical Legacy

Renouvier once said that he saved Lequyer’s work from sinking [Esquisse d’une classification systématique, v. 2, 382]. In view of Lequyer’s drowning, it is a fitting if somewhat macabre metaphor. Renouvier often quoted his friend’s work at length in his own books. His edition of The Search for a First Truth, limited though it was to one-hundred and twenty copies, ensured that Lequyer’s philosophy was presented in something like a form of which he would have approved. Renouvier included a brief “Editor’s Preface” but his name appears nowhere in the book. In publishing the book, it was his friend’s contribution to philosophy that he intended to preserve and celebrate, not his own. More widely available editions of the book were published in 1924 and 1993. Another indication of Renouvier’s respect is the marker he was instrumental in erecting over Lequyer’s grave. The inscription reads in part, “to the memory of an unhappy friend and a man of great genius.” Throughout his career he called Lequyer his “master” on the subject of free will and he took meticulous care in attributing to Lequyer the ideas that he borrowed from him. In Renouvier’s last conversations, as recorded by his disciple Louis Prat, he quoted Lequyer’s maxim, “TO MAKE . . . and, in making, TO MAKE ONESELF” as a summary of his own philosophy of personalism [Derniers entretiens, 64].

Others did not take as much care as Renouvier in giving Lequyer the credit that he was due. William James learned of Lequyer from reading Renouvier’s works and wrote to him in 1872 inquiring about The Search for a First Truth which he had not been able to locate through a bookstore. Renouvier sent him a copy which he read, at least in part, and which he donated to the Harvard Library. The essential elements of James’s mature views on free will and determinism closely parallel those of Lequyer—freedom is not merely acting in accordance with the will, the impossibility of experiencing freedom, the importance of effort of attention in the phenomenon of will, the reality of chance, the theoretical impasse between freedom and necessity, and the idea that freedom rightly affirms its own reality. James’s Oxford Street/Divinity Avenue thought experiment in his essay “The Dilemma of Determinism” could be interpreted as an application of a similar passage in the third section of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? [OC 52]. There are, to be sure, profound differences between James and Lequyer on many subjects, but where it is a question of free will and determinism the similarities are uncanny.

James always credited Renouvier for framing the issue of free will in terms of “the ambiguity of futures,” but it is clear that Renouvier was a conduit for the ideas of Lequyer. This is nowhere more evident than in James’s 1876 review of two books, by Alexander Bain and Renouvier, published in the Nation. He praises Renouvier’s ideas about freedom, but the views he highlights are the very ideas that Renouvier attributed to Lequyer. In one instance, he confuses a quote from Lequyer as belonging to Renouvier. The unwary reader, like James, assumes that it is Renouvier speaking. In his personal letters James mentions Lequyer by name, but not in any of his works written for publication. It is clear, however, that he thought highly of him. In The Principles of Psychology (1890), James mentions “a French philosopher of genius” and quotes a phrase from the concluding section of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? He cites the same phrase, slightly altered, in Some Problems of Philosophy but again not revealing the name of its author [For references, see Viney 1997/2009].

Another famous philosopher who quoted Lequyer without mentioning his name is Jean-Paul Sartre. Sartre may have learned of Lequyer in 1935 when he sat on the board of editors for the Nouvelle Revue Française. The board was considering whether to publish Grenier’s doctoral thesis, La Philosophie de Jules Lequier. The decision was against publication, but not without Sartre objecting that there was still interest among readers in freedom. In 1944, Sartre responded to critics of existentialism and affirmed as his own, the saying, “to make and in making to make oneself and to be nothing except what one has made of oneself.” This is a nearly direct quote from Lequyer. Jean Wahl, who edited a selection of Lequyer’s writings, maintained that Sartre borrowed the principle idea of L’existentialisme est un humanisme (1945) from Lequyer, to wit, that in making our own choices, we are our own creators. Lequyer is not quoted in that presentation. Seven years later, however, in a discussion of Stéphane Mallarmé’s poetry, Sartre again mentions Lequyer’s maxim, placing it in quotation marks, but without reference to the name of the Breton. If one may speak of Lequyer’s anonymous influence on James, one may perhaps speak of Lequyer’s anonymous shadow in the work of Sartre [For references see Viney 2010, 13-14].

The irony in Sartre’s quotations of Lequyer’s maxim is that he uses it not only to express a belief in freedom but also to express his atheism. Sartre rejected the idea that, God creates creatures in accordance with a detailed conception of what they will be. This is what Sartre would characterize as essence preceding existence. The formula of Sartre’s existentialism is that existence precedes essence. In Sartre’s words, it is not the case that “the individual man is the realization of a certain concept in the divine understanding” [Existentialisme est un humanisme, 28]. Of course, Lequyer agrees, but rather than adopting atheism he opted for revising the concept of God as one capable of creating other, lesser, creators. Grenier outlined Lequyer’s theology in his dissertation (just mentioned) but there is no indication—unless his silence says something—of what Sartre thought of it. Other philosophers, however, did not remain silent on Lequyer’s suggestions for revising traditional ideas about God.

After Renouvier, Grenier, and Wahl, the philosopher who made most explicit use of Lequyer’s ideas and promoted their importance was the American Charles Hartshorne. Hartshorne learned of Lequyer from Wahl in Paris in 1948. By that time, Hartshorne was far along in his career with well-developed views of his own in what is known as process philosophy and theology. Nevertheless, he thereafter consistently promoted Lequyer’s significance as a forerunner of process thought. He often quoted the Lequyerian phrase, “God created me creator of myself” and cited Lequyer as the first philosopher to clearly affirm a bilateral influence between God and the creatures. With Hartshorne, Lequyer ceased being, as in James and Sartre, the anonymously cited philosopher. Hartshorne included the first English language excerpt from Lequyer’s writings in his anthology, edited with William L. Reese, Philosophers Speak of God (1953).

Harvey H. Brimmer II (1934-1990), one of Hartshorne’s students, wrote a dissertation titled Jules Lequier and Process Philosophy (1975), which included as appendices translations of How to Find, How to Search for a First Truth? and Probus. This was the first book-length study of Lequyer in English. Brimmer argued, among other things, that the distinction for which Hartshorne is known between the existence/essence of God and the actuality of God is implicit in Lequyer’s thought. According to this idea, God’s essential nature (including the divine existence) is immutable and necessary but God is ever open to new experiences as the particular objects of God’s power, knowledge, and goodness, which are contingent, come to be. For example, it is God’s nature to know whatever exists, but the existence of this particular bird singing is contingent, and so God’s knowledge of it is contingent. Brimmer seems to be on firm footing, for Lequyer says both that God is unchanging but that there can be a change in God [OC 74, compare OC 243].

Hartshorne’s admiration for Lequyer introduced, if unintentionally, its own distortion, as though the only things that matter about Lequyer were the ways in which he anticipated process thought. It may be more accurate, for example, to interpret Lequyer as a forerunner of an evangelical “open theism”—at least a Catholic version—than of process philosophy’s version of divine openness. For example, Lequyer and the evangelical open theists affirm but Hartshorne denies the divine inspiration of the Bible and the doctrine of creation ex nihilo. We may, nevertheless, accentuate the positive by noting that many of Lequyer’s central ideas are incarnated in each variety of open theism. Also noteworthy is that some of those evangelicals who identify themselves as open theists—William Hasker, Richard Rice, and Gregory Boyd—were influenced to a greater or lesser extent by Hartshorne. That Lequyer is an important, if not the most important, pioneer of an open view of God cannot be doubted. Moreover, the combination of literary imagination and philosophical rigor that he brought to the exploration of an open view of God, especially in Probus and Abel and Abel, is unmatched.

The philosopher to whom Lequyer is most often compared is Kierkegaard. Each philosopher endeavored, in the words of Clair, to “think the singular” [Title of Clair 1993]. They would not allow, after the manner of Hegel, a dialectical aufheben in which, they believed, the individual is swallowed by the absolute [OC 347]. Choice and responsibility are central themes for both philosophers. The same can be said of the subject of faith and the “audacity and passion” (Lequyer) that it requires [OC 501]. Both men blurred the line between literature and philosophy, as often happens in superior spirits. Perhaps the best example of this is that they developed what might be called the art of Christian midrash, amending biblical narratives from their own imaginations to shed new light on the text. As Lequyer said in a Kierkegaardian tone, the Scriptures have “extraordinary silences” [OC 231]. Lequyer’s treatment of the story of Abraham and Isaac bears some similarities with what one finds in Kierkegaard’s Fear and Trembling. Both philosophers warn against reading the story in reverse as though Abraham knew all along that God would not allow Isaac to die. Lequyer says that Abraham faced a terrifying reversal of all things human and divine.

If there is a common idea that unites Lequyer and Kierkegaard it is the revitalization of Christianity. Yet, this commonality begins to dissolve under a multitude of qualifications. Kierkegaard’s criticisms of the established church in Denmark were in the truest spirit of Protestantism. Except for an early period of emotional detachment from the church, Lequyer was loyal to Catholicism. The renewal of Christianity meant something different for each philosopher. Kierkegaard spoke of reintroducing Christianity into Christendom and he maintained that the thought behind his whole work was what it means to become a Christian. A distant analogy in Lequyer’s polemic to what Kierkegaard calls “Christendom” is the reasoning of the doctors of the church. Lequyer says that the reasoning of the doctors never had any power over him, even as a child [OC 13]. Whereas Kierkegaard launched an assault on the idea of identifying an institution with Christianity, Lequyer targets the theologians whose theories he believes undercut belief in the freedom of God and of the creatures. Lequyer’s willingness to engage medieval theology on its own terms, matching argument with argument in an attempt to develop a more adequate, logically consistent, and coherent concept of God, stands in contrast to Kierkegaard’s negative dialectic that leads to faith embracing paradox.

5. Conclusion

Lequyer wrote to Renouvier in 1850 that he was writing “something unheard of” [OC 538]. The way in which his ideas and his words have sometimes been invoked without mention of his name makes this sadly ironic. Too often he has been heard from but without himself being heard of. Until recently, the unavailability of his writings in translation tended to confine detailed knowledge of his work to francophones. To make matters more difficult, as Grenier noted, he is something of an απαξ (hapax)—one of a kind. His philosophy does not readily fit any classification or historical development of ideas. Grenier wryly commented on those eager to classify philosophical schools and movements: “Meteors do not have a right to exist because they enter under no nomenclature” [Grenier 1951, 33]. The same metaphor, used more positively, is invoked by Wahl in his edition of Lequyer’s writings. Lequyer, he remarked, left mostly fragments of philosophy, but he left “brief and vivid trails” in the philosophical firmament.

Lequyer worked outside the philosophical mainstream. Yet, he can be regarded, in the expression of Xavier Tilliette, as a scout or a precursor of such diverse movements as personalism, pragmatism, existentialism, and openness theologies. Of course, it is an honor to be considered in such a light. On the other hand, like a point on the horizon on which lines converge, the distinctiveness and integrity of Lequyer’s own point-of-view is in danger of being lost by such a multitude of comparisons. It does not help matters that Lequyer failed to complete his life’s work. It is often reminiscent of Pascal’s Pensées: nuggets of insight and suggestions for argument are scattered throughout the drafts that he made of his thought. In any event, Goulven Le Brech’s assessment seems secure: “The fragmentary and unfinished work of Jules Lequier is far from having given up all its secrets” [Cahiers Jules Lequier, v. 1, 5].

6. References and Further Reading

  • The abbreviation “OC” refers to OEuvres complètes, Jean Grenier’s edition of Lequyer’s works published in 1952. “Hémon” refers to Prosper Hémon’s biography of Lequyer published in Abel et Abel (1991).
  • The Fonds Jules Lequier [Jules Lequier Archives] are at the University of Rennes. Beginning in 2010, Les amis de Jules Lequier has published annually, under the editorship of Le Brech, Cahiers Jules Lequier [Jules Lequier Notebooks] which includes articles, archival material, and previously published but difficult to find material.

a. Primary Sources

  • Lequier, Jules. 1865. La Recherche d’une première vérité, fragments posthumes [The Search for a First Truth, Postumous Fragments]. Edited by Charles Renouvier. (Saint-Cloud, Impr. de Mme Vve Belin).
  • Lequier, Jules. 1924. La Recherche d’une première vérité, fragments posthumes, recueillis par Charles Renouvier. Notice biographique, par Ludovic Dugas. Paris: Librairie Armand Colin. Dugas’ 58 page introductory essay, titled “La Vie, l’Œuvre et le Génie de Lequier” [The Life, Work, and Genius of Lequier], draws heavily on Hémon’s biography (see Lequier 1991).
  • Lequier, Jules. 1936. La Liberté [Freedom]. Textes inédits présentes par Jean Grenier. Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1948. Jules Lequier. Textes présentes par Jean Wahl. Les Classiques de la Liberté. Genève et Paris: Editions des Trois Collines.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1952. Œuvres complètes [Complete Works]. Édition de Jean Grenier. Neuchâtel, Suisse: Éditions de la Baconnière.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1985. Comment trouver, comment chercher une première vérité? Suivi de “Le Murmure de Lequier (vie imaginaire)” par Michel Valensi [How to find, how to search for a first truth? Followed by “The Murmure of Lequier (imaginary life)”]. Préface de Claude Morali. Paris: Éditions de l’éclat.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1991. Abel et Abel, suivi d’une “Notice Biographique de Jules Lequyer” [Abel and Abel followed by “A Biographical Notice of JulesLequyer”] par Prosper Hémon. Édition de G. Pyguillem. Combas: Éditions de l’Éclat. Hémon’s biography, though incomplete, is the first and most extensively researched biography of the philosopher. It was written at the end of the nineteenth century.
  • Lequier, Jules. 1993. La Recherche d’une première vérité et autres textes, édition établie et présenté par André Clair. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Lequier, Jules. 2010. La Fourche et la quenouille [The Fork and the Distaff], préface et notes par Goulven Le Brech. Bédée : Éditions Folle Avoine.

b. English Translations

  • Brimmer, Harvey H. [with Jacqueline Delobel]. 1974. “Jules Lequier’s ‘The Hornbeam Leaf’” Philosophy in Context, 3: 94-100.
  • Brimmer, Harvey H. and Jacqueline Delobel. 1975. Translations of The Problem of Knowledge (which includes “The Hornbeam Leaf”) (pp. 291-354) and Probus, or the Principle of Knowledge (pp. 362-467). The translations are included as an appendix to Brimmer’s Jules Lequier and Process Philosophy (Doctoral Dissertation, Emory University, 1975), Dissertation Abstracts International, 36, 2892A.
  • Hartshorne, Charles and William L. Reese, editors. 1953. Philosophers Speak of God. University of Chicago Press: 227-230. Contains brief selections from Probus.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1998. Translation of Works of Jules Lequyer: The Hornbeam Leaf, The Dialogue of the Predestinate and the Reprobate, Eugene and Theophilus. Foreword by Robert Kane. Lewiston, New York: The Edwin Mellen Press.
  • West, Mark. 1999. Jules Lequyer’s “Abel and Abel” Followed by “Incidents in the Life and Death of Jules Lequyer.” Translation by Mark West; Biography by Donald Wayne Viney. Foreword by William L. Reese. Lewiston, New York: The Edwin Mellen Press.

c. Secondary Sources in French and English

  • Brimmer, Harvey H. 1967. “Lequier (Joseph Louis) Jules.” The Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Edited by Paul Edwards. Volume 4: 438-439. New York: Macmillan.
  • Clair, André. 2000. Métaphysique et existence: essai sur la philosophie de Jules Lequier. Bibliothèque d’histoire de la philosophie, Nouvelle série. Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Grenier, Jean. 1936. La Philosophie de Jules Lequier. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Grenier, Jean. 1951. “Un grand philosophe inconnu et méconnu: Jules Lequier” [A great philosopher unknown and unrecognized]. Rencontre, no ll. Lausanne (novembre): 31-39.
  • Le Brech, Goulven. 2007. Jules Lequier. Rennes : La Part Commune.
  • Pyguillem, Gérard. 1985. “Renouvier et sa publication des fragments posthumes de J. Lequier,” [Renouvier and the publication of the posthumous fragments of J. Lequier]. Archives de Philosophie, 48: 653-668.
  • Séailles, Gabriel. 1898. “Un philosophe inconnu, Jules Lequier.” [An unknown philosopher, Jules Lequier]. Revue Philosophique de la France et de L’Etranger. Tome XLV: 120-150.
  • Tilliette, Xavier. 1964. Jules Lequier ou le tourment de la liberté. [Jules Lequier or the torment of freedom]. Paris: Desclée de Brouwer.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1987. “Faith as a Creative Act: Kierkegaard and Lequier on the Relation of Faith and Reason.” Faith & Creativity: Essays in Honor of Eugene H. Peters. Edited by George Nordgulen and George W. Shields. St. Louis, Missouri: CBP Press: 165-177.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1997. “William James on Free Will: The French Connection.” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 14/1 (October): 29-52. Republished in The Reception of Pragmatism in France & the Rise of Roman Catholic Modernism, 1890-1914, edited by David G. Schultenover, S. J. (Washington, D. C.: The Catholic University of America Press, 2009): 93-121.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1997. “Jules Lequyer and the Openness of God.” Faith and Philosophy, 14/2 (April): 1-24.
  • Viney, Donald W. 1999. “The Nightmare of Necessity: Jules Lequyer’s Dialogue of the Predestinate and the Reprobate.” Journal of the Association of the Interdisciplinary Study of the Arts 5/1 (Autumn): 17-30.
  • Vinson, Alain. 1992. “L’Idée d’éternité chez Jules Lequier.” [The Idea of Eternity According to Jules Lequier]. Les Études Philosophique, numéro 2 (Avril-Juin) (Philosophie française): 179-193.

Author Information

Donald Wayne Viney
Pittsburg State University
U. S. A.

German Idealism

German Idealism

German idealism is the name of a movement in German philosophy that began in the 1780s and lasted until the 1840s. The most famous representatives of this movement are Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel. While there are important differences between these figures, they all share a commitment to idealism. Kant’s transcendental idealism was a modest philosophical doctrine about the difference between appearances and things in themselves, which claimed that the objects of human cognition are appearances and not things in themselves. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel radicalized this view, transforming Kant’s transcendental idealism into absolute idealism, which holds that things in themselves are a contradiction in terms, because a thing must be an object of our consciousness if it is to be an object at all.

German idealism is remarkable for its systematic treatment of all the major parts of philosophy, including logic, metaphysics and epistemology, moral and political philosophy, and aesthetics.  All of the representatives of German idealism thought these parts of philosophy would find a place in a general system of philosophy. Kant thought this system could be derived from a small set of interdependent principles. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel were, again, more radical. Inspired by Karl Leonhard Reinhold, they attempted to derive all the different parts of philosophy from a single, first principle. This first principle came to be known as the absolute, because the absolute, or unconditional, must precede all the principles which are conditioned by the difference between one principle and another.

Although German idealism is closely related to developments in the intellectual history of Germany in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, such as classicism and romanticism, it is also closely related to larger developments in the history of modern philosophy. Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel sought to overcome the division between rationalism and empiricism that had emerged during the early modern period. The way they characterized these tendencies has exerted a lasting influence on the historiography of modern philosophy. Although German idealism itself has been subject to periods of neglect in the last two hundred years, renewed interest in the contributions of the German idealism have made it an important resource for contemporary philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. Logic
  3. Metaphysics and Epistemology
  4. Moral and Political Philosophy
  5. Aesthetics
  6. Reception and Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Kant
      1. German Editions of Kant’s Works
      2. Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant in Translation
      3. Other English Translations of Kant’s Works
    2. Fichte
      1. German Editions of Fichte’s Works
      2. English Translations of Fichte’s Works
    3. Hegel
      1. German Editions of Hegel’s Works
      2. English Translations of Hegel’s Works
        1. Cambridge Hegel Translations
        2. Other English Translations of Hegel’s Works
    4. Schelling
      1. German Editions of Schelling’s Works
      2. English Translations of Schelling’s Works
    5. Editions and Translations of Other Primary Sources
      1. Jacobi
      2. Reinhold
      3. Hölderlin
      4. Kierkegaard, Søren
      5. Marx
      6. Schopenhauer
    6. Other Works on German Idealism

1. Historical Background


German idealism can be traced back to the “critical” or “transcendental” idealism of Immanuel Kant (1724-1804). Kant’s idealism first came to prominence during the pantheism controversy in 1785-1786. When the controversy arose, Kant had already published the first (A) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason (1781) and the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783). Both works had their admirers, but they received unsympathetic and generally uncomprehending reviews, conflating Kant’s “transcendental” idealism with Berkeley’s “dogmatic” idealism (Allison and Heath 2002, 160-166). Thus, Kant was taken to hold that space and time are “not actual” and that the understanding “makes” the objects of our cognition (Sassen 2000, 53-54).

Kant insisted that this reading misrepresented his position. While the dogmatic idealist denies the reality of space and time, Kant takes space and time to be forms of intuition. Forms of intuition are, for Kant, the subjective conditions of the possibility of all of our sense perception. It is only because space and time are a priori forms that determine the content of our sensations that Kant thinks we can perceive anything at all. According to Kant, “critical” or “transcendental” idealism serves merely to identify those a priori conditions, like space and time, that make experience possible. It certainly does not imply that space and time are unreal or that the understanding produces the objects of our cognition by itself.

Kant hoped to enlist the support of famous German philosophers like Moses Mendelssohn (1729-1786), Johan Nicolai Tetens (1738-1807), and Christian Garve (1742-1798) in order to refute the “dogmatic” idealist interpretation of his philosophy and win a more favorable hearing for his work. Unfortunately, the endorsements Kant hoped for never arrived. Mendelssohn, in particular, was preoccupied with concerns about his health and the dispute that had arisen between himself and Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743-1819) about the alleged Spinozism of his friend Gotthold Ephraim Lessing (1729-1781). This dispute came to be known as the pantheism controversy, because of Spinoza’s famous equivocation between God and nature.

During the controversy, Jacobi charged that any attempt to demonstrate philosophical truths was fatally flawed. Jacobi pointed to Spinoza as the chief representative of the tendency toward demonstrative reason in philosophy, but he also drew parallels between Spinozism and Kant’s transcendental idealism throughout On the Doctrine of Spinoza (1785). In 1787, the same year Kant published the second (B) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, Jacobi published David Hume on Faith or Realism and Idealism, which included a supplement On Transcendental Idealism. Jacobi concluded that transcendental idealism, like Spinozism, subordinates the immediate certainty, or faith, through which we know the world, to demonstrative reason, transforming reality into an illusion. Jacobi later called this “nihilism.”

Kant’s views were defended by Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757-1823) during the pantheism controversy. Reinhold thought Kant’s philosophy could refute skepticism and nihilism and provide a defense of morality and religion which was not to be found in the rationalism of the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy. The publication of Reinhold’s Letters on the Kantian Philosophy, first in Der Teutsche Merkur in 1786-1787 and then again in an enlarged version in 1790-1792, helped make Kant’s philosophy one of the most influential, and most controversial, philosophies of the period. Jacobi remained a thorn in the side of the Kantians and the young German idealists, but he was unable to staunch interest in philosophy in general or idealism in particular.

In 1787, Reinhold assumed a position at the university in Jena, where he taught Kant’s philosophy and began developing his own ideas. While Reinhold’s thought continued to be influenced by Kant, he also came to believe that Kant had failed to provide philosophy with a solid foundation. According to Reinhold, Kant was a philosophical genius, but he did not have the “genius of system” that would allow him to properly order his discoveries. Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie (Elementary Philosophy/Philosophy of Elements), laid out in his Essay Towards a New Theory of the Faculty of Representation (1789), Contribution to the Correction of the Previous Misunderstandings of the Philosophers (1790), and On the Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge (1791), was intended to address this shortcoming and show that Kant’s philosophy could be derived from a single foundational principle. Reinhold called this principle “the principle of consciousness” and states that “in consciousness, representation is distinguished by the subject from subject and object and is referred to both.” With this principle, Reinhold thought he could explain what is fundamental to all cognition, namely, that 1) cognition is essentially the conscious representation of an object by a subject and 2) that representations refer to both the subject and object of cognition.

When Reinhold left Jena for a new position in Kiel in 1794, his chair was given to Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814), who quickly radicalized Kant’s idealism and Reinhold’s attempts to systematize philosophy. In response to a skeptical challenge to Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie, raised anonymously by Gottlob Ernst Schulze (1761-1833) in his work Aenesidemus (1792), Fichte asserted that the principle of representation was not, as Reinhold had maintained, a fact (Tatsache) of consciousness, but rather an act (Tathandlung) whereby consciousness produces the distinction between subject and object by positing the distinction between the I and not-I (Breazeale, 1988, 64). This insight became the foundation of Fichte’s Wissenschaftslehre (Doctrine of Science/Doctrine of Scientific Knowledge) which was first published in 1794. It was soon followed by Fichte’s Foundations of Natural Right (1797) and the System of Ethics (1798). In later years, Fichte presented a number of substantially different versions of the Wissenschaftslehre in lectures in Berlin.

When, as a result of a controversy concerning his religious views, Fichte left Jena in 1799, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775-1854) became the most important idealist in Jena. Schelling had arrived in Jena in 1798, when he was only 23 years old, but he was already an enthusiastic proponent of Fichte’s philosophy, which he defended in early works like On the I as Principle of Philosophy (1795). Schelling had also established close relationships with the Jena romantics, who, despite their great interest in Kant, Reinhold, and Fichte, maintained a more skeptical attitude towards philosophy than the German idealists. Although Schelling did not share the romantics’ reservations about idealism, the proximity between Schelling and the romantics is evident in Schelling’s writings on the philosophy of nature and the philosophy of art, which he presented in his Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature (1797), System of Transcendental Idealism (1800), and Philosophy of Art (1802-1803).

Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770-1831) had been Schelling’s classmate in Tübingen from 1790-1793. Along with the poet Friedrich Hölderlin (1770-1843), the two had collaborated on The Oldest Program for a System of German Idealism (1796). After following Schelling to Jena in 1801, Hegel published his first independent contributions to German idealism, The Difference Between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy (1801), in which he distinguishes Fichte’s “subjective” idealism from Schelling’s “objective” or “absolute” idealism. Hegel’s work documented the growing rift between Fichte and Schelling. This rift was to expand following Hegel’s falling-out with Schelling in 1807, when Hegel published his monumental Phenomenology of Spirit (1807). Although Hegel only published three more books during his lifetime, Science of Logic (1812-1816), Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences (1817-1830), and Elements of the Philosophy of Right (1821), he remains the most widely-read and most influential of the German idealists.

2. Logic

The German idealists have acquired a reputation for obscurity, because of the length and complexity of many of their works. As a consequence, they are often considered to be obscurantists and irrationalists. The German idealists were, however, neither obscurantists nor irrationalists. Their contributions to logic are earnest attempts to formulate a modern logic that is consistent with the idealism of their metaphysics and epistemology.

Kant was the first of the German idealists to make important contributions to logic. In the Preface to the second (B) edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant argues that logic has nothing to do with metaphysics, psychology, or anthropology, because logic is “the science that exhaustively presents and strictly proves nothing but the formal rules of all thinking” (Guyer and Wood 1998, 106-107/Bviii-Bix). Kant came to refer to this purely formal logic as “general” logic, which is to be contrasted with the “Transcendental Logic” that he develops in the second part of the “Transcendental Doctrine of Elements” in the Critique of Pure Reason. Transcendental logic differs from general logic because, like the principles of a priori sensibility that Kant presents in the “Transcendental Aesthetic” of the Critique of Pure Reason, transcendental logic is part of metaphysics. Transcendental logic also differs from general logic because it does not abstract from the content of cognition. Transcendental logic contains the laws of pure thinking as they pertain to the cognition of objects. This does not mean that transcendental logic is concerned with empirical objects as such, but rather with the a priori conditions of the possibility of the cognition of objects. Kant’s famous “Transcendental Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding” is meant to demonstrate that the concepts the transcendental logic presents as the a priori conditions of the possibility of the cognition of objects do, in fact, make the cognition of objects possible and are necessary conditions for any and all cognition of objects.

In The Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge, Reinhold objects that Kant’s transcendental logic presupposed general logic, because transcendental logic is a “particular” logic from which general logic, or “logic proper, without surnames,” cannot be derived. Reinhold insisted that the laws of general logic had to be derived from the principle of consciousness if philosophy was to become systematic and scientific, but the possibility of this derivation was contested by Schulze in Aenesidemus. Schulze’s critique of Reinhold’s Elementarphilosophie focuses on the priority Reinhold attributes to the principle of consciousness. Because the principle of consciousness has to be consistent with basic logical principles like the principle of non-contradiction and the principle of the excluded middle, Schulze concluded that it could not be regarded as a first principle. The laws of general logic were, it seemed, prior to the principle of consciousness, so that even the Elementarphilosophie presupposed general logic.

Fichte accepted many aspects of Schulze’s critique of Reinhold, but, like Reinhold, he thought it was crucial to demonstrate that the laws of logic could be derived from "real philosophy” or “metaphysics.” In his Personal Meditations on the Elementarphilosophie (1792-1793), his essay Concerning the Concept of the Wissenschaftslehre (1794), and then again in the Wissenschaftslehre of 1794, Fichte argued that the act that posits the distinction between the I and not-I determines consciousness in a way that makes logical analysis possible. Logical analysis is always undertaken reflectively, according to Fichte, because it presupposes that consciousness has already been determined in some way. So, while Kant maintains that transcendental logic presupposes general logic, Reinhold attempts to derive the laws of general logic from the principle of consciousness, and Schulze shows Reinhold to presuppose the same principles, Fichte forcefully asserts that logic presupposes the determination of thought “as a fact of consciousness,” which itself depends upon the act through which consciousness is originally determined.

Hegel’s contributions to logic have been far more influential than those of Reinhold or Fichte. His Science of Logic (also known as the “Greater Logic”) and the Logic that constitutes the first part of the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences (also known as the “Lesser Logic”) are not contributions to earlier debates about the priority of general logic. Nor do they accept that what Kant called “general” logic and Reinhold called “logic proper, without surnames” is purely formal logic. Because Hegel was convinced that truth is both formal and material, and not one or the other, he sought to establish the dialectical unity of the formal and the material in his works on logic. The meaning of the word “dialectical” is, of course, much debated, as is the specific mechanism through which the dialectic produces and resolves the contradictions that move thought from one form of consciousness to another. For Hegel, however, this process accounts for the genesis of the categories and concepts through which all cognition is determined. Logic reveals the unity of that process.

German idealism’s contributions to logic were largely dismissed following the rise of empiricism and positivism in the nineteenth century, as well as the revolutions in logic that took place at the beginning of the twentieth century. Today, however, there is a renewed interest in this part of the idealist tradition, as is evident in the attention which has been paid to Kant’s lectures on logic and the new editions and translations of Hegel’s writings and lectures on logic.

3. Metaphysics and Epistemology

German idealism is a form of idealism. The idealism espoused by the German idealists is, however, different from other kinds of idealism with which contemporary philosophers may be more familiar. While earlier idealists maintained that reality is ultimately intellectual rather than material (Plato) or that the existence of objects is mind-dependent (Berkeley), the German idealists reject the distinctions these views presuppose. In addition to the distinction between the material and the formal and the distinction between the real and the ideal, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel also reject the distinction between being and thinking, further complicating the German idealists’ views on metaphysics and epistemology.

Kant’s idealism is, perhaps, the most moderate form of idealism associated with German idealism. Kant holds that the objects of human cognition are transcendentally ideal and empirically real. They are transcendentally ideal, because the conditions of the cognition human beings have of objects are to be found in the cognitive faculties of human beings. This does not mean the existence of those objects is mind-dependent, because Kant thinks we can only know objects to the extent that they are objects for us and, thus, as they appear to us. Idealism with respect to appearances does not entail the mind-dependence of objects, because it does not commit itself to any claims about the nature of things in themselves. Kant denies that we have any knowledge of things in themselves, because we do not have the capacity to make judgments about the nature of things in themselves based on our knowledge of things as they appear.

Despite our ignorance of things in themselves, Kant thought we could have objectively valid cognition of empirically real objects. Kant recognized that we are affected by things outside ourselves and that this affection produces sensations. These sensations are, for Kant, the “matter” of sensible intuition. Along with the pure “forms” of intuition, space and time, sensations constitute the “matter” of judgment. The pure concepts of the understanding are the “forms” of judgment, which Kant demonstrates to be the conditions of the possibility of objectively valid cognition in the “Deduction of the Pure Concepts of the Understanding” in the Critique of Pure Reason. The synthesis of matter and form in judgment therefore produces objectively valid cognition of empirically real objects

To say that the idealism of Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel is more radical than Kant’s idealism is to understate the difference between Kant and the philosophers he inspired. Kant proposed a “modest” idealism, which attempted to prove that our knowledge of appearances is objectively valid. Fichte, however, maintains the very idea of a thing in itself, a thing which is not an object for us and which exists independently of our consciousness, is a contradiction in terms. There can be no thing in itself, Fichte claims, because a thing is only a thing when it is something for us. Even the thing in itself is, in fact, a product of our own conscious thought, meaning the thing in itself is nothing other a postulation of our own consciousness. Thus, it is not a thing in itself, but just another object for us.  From this line of reasoning, Fichte concludes that “everything which occurs in our mind can be completely explained and comprehended on the basis of the mind itself” (Breazeale 1988, 69). This is a much more radical form of idealism than Kant maintained. For Fichte holds that consciousness is a circle in which the I posits itself and determines what belongs to the I and what belongs to the not-I. This circularity is necessary and unavoidable, Fichte maintains, but philosophy is a reflective activity in which the spontaneous positing activity of the I and the determinations of the I and not-I are comprehended.

Schelling defended Fichte’s idealism in On the I as Principle of Philosophy, where he maintained that the I is the unconditioned condition of both being and thinking. Because the existence of the I precedes all thinking (I must exist in order to think) and because thinking determines all being (A thing is nothing other than an object of thought), Schelling argued, the absolute I, not Reinhold’s principle of consciousness, must be the fundamental principle of all philosophy. In subsequent works like the System of Transcendental Idealism, however, Schelling pursued a different course, arguing that the essential and primordial unity of being and thinking can be understood from two different directions, beginning either with nature or spirit. It could be deduced from the absolute I as Fichte had done, but it could also arise from the unconscious but dynamic powers of nature. By showing how these two different approaches complemented one another, Schelling thought he had shown how the distinction between being and thinking, nature and spirit, could be overcome.

Fichte was not pleased with the innovations of Schelling’s idealism, because he initially thought of Schelling as a disciple and a defender of his own position. Fichte did not initially respond to Schelling’s works, but, in an exchange that began in 1800, he began to argue that Schelling had confused the real and the ideal, making the I, the ideal, dependent upon nature, the real. Fichte thought this violated the principles of transcendental idealism and his own Wissenschaftslehre, leading him to suspect that Schelling was no longer the disciple he took him to be. Intervening on Schelling’s behalf as the dispute became more heated, Hegel argued that Fichte’s idealism was “subjective” idealism, while Schelling’s idealism was “objective” idealism. This means that Fichte considers the I to be the absolute and denies the identity of the I and the not-I. He privileges the subject at the expense of the identity of subject and object. Schelling, however, attempts to establish the identity of the subject and object by establishing the objectivity of the subject, the I, as well as the subjectivity of the object, nature. The idealism Schelling and Hegel defend recognizes the identity of subject and object as the “absolute,” unconditioned first principle of philosophy. For that reason, it is often called the philosophy of identity.

It is clear that by the time he published the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel was no longer interested in defending Schelling’s system. In the Phenomenology, Hegel famously calls Schelling’s understanding of the identity of subject and object “the night in which all cows are black,” meaning that Schelling’s conception of the identity of subject and object erases the many and varied distinctions which determine the different forms of consciousness. These distinctions are crucial for Hegel, who came to believe that the absolute can only be realized by passing through the different forms of consciousness which are comprehended in the self-consciousness of absolute knowledge or spirit (Geist).

Contemporary scholars like Robert Pippin and Robert Stern have debated whether Hegel’s position is to be regarded as a metaphysical or merely epistemological form of idealism, because it is not entirely clear whether Hegel regarded the distinctions that constitute the different forms of consciousness as merely the conditions necessary for understanding objects (Pippin) or whether they express fundamental commitments about the way things are (Stern). However, it is almost certainly true that Hegel’s idealism is both epistemological and metaphysical. Like Fichte and Schelling, Hegel sought to overcome the limits Kant’s transcendental idealism had placed on philosophy, in order to complete the idealist revolution he had begun. The German idealists agreed that this could only be done by tracing all the different parts of philosophy back to a single principle, whether that principle is the I (in Fichte and the early Schelling) or the absolute (in Hegel).

4. Moral and Political Philosophy

The moral and political philosophy of the German idealists is perhaps the most influential part of their legacy, but it is also one of the most controversial. Many appreciate the emphasis Kant placed on freedom and autonomy in both morality and politics; yet they reject Kant’s moral and political philosophy for its formalism. Fichte’s moral and political philosophy has only recently been studied in detail, but his popular and polemical writings have led some to see him as an extreme nationalist and, perhaps, a precursor to fascism. Hegel is, by some accounts, an apologist for the totalitarian “absolute state.” In what follows, a more even-handed assessment of their views and their merits is developed.

Kantian moral philosophy has been an important part of moral theory since the nineteenth century. Today, it is commonly associated with deontological moral theories, which emphasize duty and obligation, as well as constructivism, which is concerned with the procedures through which moral norms are constructed. Supporters of both approaches frequently refer to the categorical imperative and the different formulations of that imperative which are to be found in Kant’s Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785) and the Critique of Practical Reason (1788). They often take the categorical imperative, or one of its formulations, as a general definition of the right or the good.

The categorical imperative served a slightly different purpose for Kant. In the Groundwork, Kant uses the categorical imperative to define the form of the good will. Kant thought moral philosophy was primarily concerned with the determination of the will. The categorical imperative shows that, in order to be good, the will must be determined according to a rule that is both universal and necessary. Any violation of this rule would result in a contradiction and, therefore, moral impossibility. The categorical imperative provides Kant with a valid procedure and a universal and necessary determination of what is morally obligatory.

Yet in order to determine the will, Kant thought human beings had to be free.  Because freedom cannot be proven in theoretical philosophy, however, Kant says that reason forces us to recognize the concept of freedom as a “fact” of pure practical reason. Kant thinks freedom is necessary for any practical philosophy, because the moral worth and merit of human beings depends on the way they determine their own wills. Without freedom, they would not be able to determine their own wills to the good and we could not hold them responsible for their actions. Thus freedom and autonomy are absolutely crucial for Kant’s understanding of moral philosophy. The political significance of autonomy becomes apparent in some of Kant’s late essays, where he supports a republican politics of freedom, equality, and the rule of law.

Kant’s moral philosophy affected Fichte profoundly, especially the Critique of Practical Reason. “I have been living in a new world ever since reading the Critique of Practical Reason,” Fichte reports, “propositions which I thought could never be overturned have been overturned for me. Things have been proven to me which I thought could never be proven, e.g., the concept of absolute freedom, the concept of duty, etc., and I feel all the happier for it” (Breazeale 1988, 357). His passion for Kant’s moral philosophy can be seen in the Aenesidemus review, where Fichte defends the “primacy” of practical reason over theoretical reason, which he takes to be the foundation of Kant’s “moral theology.”

Despite his admiration for Kant’s moral philosophy, Fichte thought he could go beyond Kant’s formalism. In his essay Concerning the Concept of Wissenschaftslehre, Fichte describes the second, practical part of his plan for Wissenschaftslehre, in which “new and thoroughly elaborated theories of the pleasant, the beautiful, the sublime, the free obedience of nature to its own laws, God, so-called common sense or the natural sense of truth” are laid out, but which also contains “new theories of natural law and morality, the principles of which are material as well as formal” (Breazeale 1988, 135). Unlike Kant, in other words, Fichte would not simply determine the form of the good will, but the ways in which moral and political principles are applied in action.

Fichte's interest in the material principles of moral and political philosophy can be seen in his Foundations of Natural Right and System of Ethics. In both works, Fichte emphasizes the applicability of moral and political principles to action. But he also emphasizes the social context in which these principles are applied. While the I posits itself as well as the not-I, Fichte thinks the I must posit itself as an individual among other individuals, if it is to posit itself “as a rational being with self-consciousness.” The presence of others checks the freedom of the I, because the principles of morality and natural right both require that individual freedom cannot interfere with the freedom of other individuals. Thus the freedom of the I and the relations between individuals and members of the community are governed by the principles of morality and right, which may be applied to all their actions and interactions.

Hegel was also concerned about the formalism of Kant’s moral philosophy, but Hegel approached the problem in a slightly different way than Fichte. In the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel describes the breakdown of the “ethical life” (Sittlichkeit) of the community. Hegel understands ethical life as the original unity of social life. While he thinks the unity of ethical life precedes any understanding of the community as a free association of individuals, Hegel also thinks the unity of ethical life is destined to break down. As members of the community become conscious of themselves as individuals, through the conflicts that arise between family and city and between religious law and civil law, ethical life becomes more and more fragmented and the ties that bind the community become less and less immediate. This process is illustrated, in the Phenomenology, by Hegel’s famous – if elliptical – retelling of Sophocles’ Antigone.

Hegel provides a different account of ethical life in the Foundations of the Philosophy of Right. In this work, he contrasts ethical life with morality and abstract right. Abstract right is the name Hegel gives to the idea that individuals are the sole bearers of right. The problem with this view is that it abstracts right from the social and political context in which individuals exercise their rights and realize their freedom. Morality differs from abstract right, because morality recognizes the good as something universal rather than particular. Morality recognizes the “common good” of the community as something that transcends the individual; yet it defines the good through a purely formal system of obligations, which is, in the end, no less abstract than abstract right. Ethical life is not presented as the original unity of the habits and customs of the community, but, rather, as a dynamic system in which individuals, families, civil society, and the state come together to promote the realization of human freedom.

Traditional accounts of Hegel’s social and political philosophy have seen Hegel’s account of ethical life as an apology for the Prussian state. This is understandable, given the role the state plays in the final section of the Philosophy of Right on “World History.” Here Hegel says “self-consciousness finds in an organic development the actuality of its substantive knowing and willing” in the Germanic state (Wood 1991, 379-380). To see the state as the culmination of world history and the ultimate realization of human freedom is, however, to overlook several important factors, including Hegel’s personal commitments to political reform and personal freedom. These commitments are reflected in Hegel’s defense of freedom in the Philosophy of Right, as well as the role he thought the family and especially civil society played in ethical life.

5. Aesthetics

The German idealists’ interest in aesthetics distinguishes them from other modern systematic philosophers (Descartes, Leibniz, Wolff ) for whom aesthetics was a matter of secondary concern at best. And while there was, to be sure, considerable disagreement about the relationship between art, aesthetics, and philosophy among the German idealists, the terms of their disagreement continue to be debated in philosophy and the arts.

For most of his career, Kant regarded aesthetics as an empirical critique of taste. In lectures and notes from the 1770s, several of which were later incorporated into Kant’s Logic (1800), Kant denies that aesthetics can be a science. Kant changed his mind in 1787, when he told Reinhold he had discovered the a priori principles of the faculty of feeling pleasure and displeasure. Kant laid out these principles in the first part of the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), where he characterizes aesthetic judgment as a “reflective” judgment, based on “the consciousness of the merely formal purposiveness in the play of the cognitive powers of the subject with regard to the animation of its cognitive powers” (Guyer and Matthews 2000, 106-107). According to Kant, it is the free yet harmonious play of our cognitive faculties in aesthetic judgment that is the source of the feeling of pleasure that we associate with beauty.

Reinhold and Fichte had little to say about art and beauty, despite the Fichte’s promise to deal with the subject in the second, practical part of his Wissenschaftslehre. Aesthetics was, however, of critical importance for Schelling, Hegel, and Hölderlin. In the Oldest Program for a System of German Idealism, they write that beauty is “the idea that unites everything” and “the highest act of reason” (Bernstein 2003, 186). Thus they insist that the “philosophy of spirit” must also be an “aesthetic” philosophy, uniting the sensible and the intellectual as well as the real and the ideal.

It was Schelling, rather than Hegel or Hölderlin, who did the most to formulate this “aesthetic” philosophy in the years following his move to Jena. In the System of Transcendental Idealism and Philosophy of Art, Schelling argues that the absolute is both revealed by and embodied in works of art. Art is, for Schelling, “the only true and eternal organ and document of philosophy” (Heath 1978, 231). Art is of  “paramount” importance to the philosopher, because it opens up “the holy of holies, where burns in eternal and original unity, as if in a single flame, that which is rent asunder in nature and history and that which, in life and action, no less than in thought, must forever fly apart” (Heath 1978, 231).

Hegel would later contest Schelling’s characterization of the artwork and its relation to philosophy in his Lectures on Fine Arts. According to Hegel, art is not the revelation and embodiment of philosophy, but an alienated form of self-consciousness. The greatest expression of spirit is not to be found in the work of art, as Schelling suggested, but in the “idea.” Beauty, which Hegel calls “the sensuous appearance of the idea,” is not an adequate expression of the absolute, precisely because it is a sensuous appearance. Nevertheless, Hegel acknowledges that the alienated and sensuous appearance of the idea can play an important role in the dialectical process through which we become conscious of the absolute in philosophy. He distinguishes three kinds of art, symbolic art, classical art, and romantic art, corresponding to three different stages in the development of our consciousness of the absolute, which express different aspects of the idea in different ways.

Hegel argues that the kind of art that corresponds to the first stage in the development of our understanding of spirit, symbolic art, fails to adequately represent the idea, but points to the idea as something beyond itself. This “beyond” cannot be captured by images, plastic forms, or words and therefore remains abstract for symbolic art. However, the art corresponding to the second stage in the development of our understanding of spirit, classical art, strives to reconcile the abstract and the concrete in an individual work. It aims to present a perfect, sensible expression of the idea and, for that reason, represents the “ideal” of beauty for Hegel. Yet the problem remains, inasmuch as the idea which is expressed by classical art is not, in itself, sensible. The sensible presentation of the idea remains external to the idea itself. Romantic art calls attention to this fact by emphasizing the sensuousness and individuality of the work. Unlike symbolic art, however, romantic art supposes that the idea can be discovered within and through the work of art. In effect, the work of art tries to reveal the truth of the idea in itself. Yet when the idea is grasped concretely, in itself, rather than through the work of art, we have achieved a philosophical understanding of the absolute, which does not require the supplement of sensible appearance. For this reason, Hegel speculated that the emergence of philosophical self-consciousness signaled the end of art. “The form of art,” he says, “has ceased to be the supreme need of spirit” (Knox 1964, 10).

Hegel’s thesis concerning the “end” of art has been widely debated and raises many important questions. What, for example, are we to make of developments in the arts that occurred “after” the end of art? What purpose might art continue to serve, if we have already achieved philosophical self-consciousness? And, perhaps most importantly, has philosophy really achieved absolute knowledge, which would render any “sensuous appearance” of the idea obsolete? These are important questions, but they are difficult to answer. Like Kant and Schelling, Hegel’s views on aesthetics were part of his philosophical system, and they served a specific purpose within that system. To question the end of art in Hegel is, for that reason, to question the entire system and the degree to which it presents a true account of the absolute. Yet that also is why aesthetics and the philosophy of art allow us important insight into Hegel’s thought and the thought of the German idealists more generally.

6. Reception and Influence

Fichte, Hegel, and Schelling ended their careers in the same chair in Berlin. Fichte spent his later years reformulating the Wissenschaftslehre in lectures and seminars, hoping to finally find an audience that understood him. Hegel, who was called to take Fichte’s chair upon his death, lectured on the history of philosophy, the philosophy of history, the philosophy of religion, and the philosophy of fine art (his lectures on these subjects have been no less influential than his published works). Hegel gained a considerable following among both conservatives and liberals in Berlin, who came to be known as “right” (or “old”) and “left” (or “young”) Hegelians. Schelling’s views seem to have changed the most between the turn of the century and his arrival in Berlin. The “positive” philosophy he articulated in his late works is no longer idealist, because Schelling no longer maintains that being and thinking are identical. Nor does the late Schelling think that thought can ground itself in its own activity. Instead, thought must find its ground in “the primordial kind of all being.”

Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860), Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855), and Karl Marx (1818-1883) all witnessed the decline of German idealism in Berlin. Schopenhauer had studied with Schulze in Göttingen and attended Fichte’s lectures in Berlin, but he is not considered a German idealist by many historians of philosophy. Some, like Günter Zöller, have argued against this exclusion, suggesting that the first edition of The World as Will and Representation is, in fact, “the first completely execute post-Kantian philosophical system” (Ameriks 2000, 101). Whether or not this system is really idealist is, however, a matter of some dispute. Claims that Schopenhauer is not an idealist usually take as their starting point the second part of The World as Will and Representation, where Schopenhauer claims that the representations of the “pure subject of cognition” are grounded in the will and, ultimately, in the body.

It is easier to distinguish Kierkegaard and Marx from the German idealists than Schopenhauer, though Kierkegaard and Marx are perhaps as different from one another as they could possibly be. Kierkegaard studied with the late Schelling, but, like Jacobi, rejected reason and philosophy in the name of faith. Many of his works are elaborate parodies of the kind of reasoning to be found in the works of the German idealists, especially Hegel. Marx, along with another one of Schelling’s students, Friedrich Engels (1820-1895), came to deride idealism as the “German ideology.” Marx and Engels charged that idealism had never really broken with religion, that it comprehended the world through abstract, logical categories, and, finally, mistook mere ideas for real things. Marx and Engels promoted their own historical materialism as an alternative to the ideology of idealism.

There is a tendency to overemphasize figures like Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, and Marx in the history of philosophy in the nineteenth century, but this distorts our understanding of the developments taking place at the time. It was the rise of empirical methods in the natural sciences and historical-critical methods in the human sciences, as well as the growth of Neo-Kantianism and positivism that led to the eclipse of German idealism, not the blistering critiques of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Marx, and Nietzsche. Neo-Kantianism, in particular, sought to leave behind the speculative excesses of German idealism and extract from Kant those ideas that were useful for the philosophy of the natural and human sciences. In the process, they established Neo-Kantianism as the dominant philosophical school in Germany at the end of the nineteenth century.

Despite its general decline, German idealism remained an important influence on the British idealism of F.H. Bradley (1846-1924) and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923) at the beginning of the twentieth century. The rejection of British idealism was one of common features of early analytic philosophy, though it would be wrong to suppose that Bertrand Russell (1872-1970), G.E. Moore (1873-1958), and others rejected idealism for purely philosophical reasons. The belief that German idealism was at least partly responsible for German nationalism and aggression was common among philosophers of Russell’s generation and only became stronger after World War I and World War II. The famous depiction of Hegel as an “enemy of liberty” and a “totalitarian” in The Open Society and its Enemies (1946) by Karl Popper (1902-1994) builds upon this view. And while it would be difficult to prove that any particular philosophy was responsible for German nationalism or the rise of fascism, it is true that the works of Fichte and Hegel were, like those of Nietzsche, favorite references for German nationalists and, later, the Nazis.

The works of the German idealists, especially Hegel, became important in France during the 1930s. Lectures on Hegel by Alexander Kojeve’s (1902-1968) influenced a generation of French intellectuals, including Georges Bataille (1897-1962), Jacques Lacan (1901-1981) and Jean-Paul Satre (1905-1980). Kojeve’s understanding of Hegel is idiosyncratic, but, together with the works of Jean Wahl (1888-1974), Alexandre Koyré (1892-1964), and Jean Hyppolite (1907-1968), his approach remains influential in continental European philosophy.  Objections to the anthropocentrism of German idealism can usually be traced back to this tradition and especially to Kojeve, who saw Hegel’s dialectic as a historical process through which the problems that define humanity are resolved. The end of this process is, for Kojeve, the end of history, which was popularized by Frances Fukayama (1952-) in The End of History and the Last Man (1992). Charges that German idealism is dogmatic, rationalist, foundationalist, and totalizing in its attempt to systematize, and ultimately an egocentric “philosophy of the subject,” which are also common in continental philosophy, merit more serious concern, given the emphasis Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel place on the “I” and the extent of their philosophical ambitions. Yet even these charges have been undermined in recent years by new historical scholarship and a greater understanding of the problems that actually motivated the German idealists.

There has been considerable interest in German idealism in the last twenty years, as hostility waned in analytic philosophy, traditional assumptions faded in continental philosophy, and bridges were built between the two approaches. Philosophers like Richard Bernstein and Richard Rorty, inspired by Wilfrid Sellars, may be credited with re-introducing Hegel to analytic philosophy as an alternative to classical empiricism. Robert Pippin later defended a non-metaphysical Hegel, which has been a subject of intense debate, but which has also made Hegel relevant to contemporary debates about realism and anti-realism. More recently, Robert Brandom has championed the “normative” conception of rationality that he finds in Kant and Hegel, and which suggests that concepts function as rules regulating judgment rather than mere representations. Some, like Catherine Malabou, have even attempted to apply the insights of the German idealists to contemporary neuroscience. Finally, it would be remiss not to mention the extraordinary historical-philosophical scholarship, in both German and English, that has been produced on German idealism in recent years. The literature listed in the bibliography has not only enriched our understanding of German idealism with new editions, translations, and commentaries, it has also expanded the horizons of philosophical scholarship by identifying new problems and new solutions to problems arising in different traditions and contexts.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Kant

i. German Editions of Kant’s Works

  • Weischedel. Wilhelm. ed. Kants Werke in sechs Bänden. Wiesbaden: lnsel Verlag, 1956-1962.
  • Kants Gesammalte Schriften, herausgegeben von der Preussischen Akademie der
  • Wissenschaften. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1902.

ii. Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant in Translation

  • Bowman, Curtis, Guyer, Paul, and Rauscher, Frederick, trans. and Guyer, Paul, ed. Immanuel Kant: Notes and Fragments. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Allison, Henry and Heath, Peter, eds. Immanuel Kant: Theoretical Philosophy After 1781. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Guyer, Paul and Matthews, Eric, trans. and eds. Immanuel Kant: Critique of the Power of Judgment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Arnulf Zweig, trans. and ed. Immanuel Kant: Correspondence. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Guyer, Paul and Wood, Allen W. Immanuel Kant: Critique of Pure Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Heath, Peter and Schneewind, Jerome B., trans. and eds. Lectures on Ethics. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Ameriks, Karl and Naragon, Steve, trans. and eds. Immanuel Kant: Lectures on Metaphysics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Gregor, Mary, trans. and ed. Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Wood, Allen W. and di Giovanni, George, trans. and eds. Immanuel Kant: Religion and Rational Theology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Walford, David and Meerbote, Ralf, trans. and eds. Immanuel Kant: Theoretical Philosophy, 1755-1770. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
  • Young, J. Michel, trans. and ed. Immanuel Kant: Lectures on Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.

iii. Other English Translations of Kant’s Works

  • Kemp Smith, Norman, trans. The Critique of Pure Reason. London: Palgrave MacMillan, 2003.
  • Pluhar, Werner, trans. Critique of Judgment, Including the First Introduction. Indianapolis: Hackett, Publishing, 1987.
  • Allison, Henry E., trans. The Kant-Eberhard Controversy. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1973.

b. Fichte

i. German Editions of Fichte’s Works

  • Fichte, Immanuel Hermann, ed. Fichtes Werke. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1971.
  • Lauth, Reinhard, Gliwitzky, Hans, and Jacob, Hans. eds. J.G. Fichte: Gesamtausgabe der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog Verlag, 1962.

ii. English Translations of Fichte’s Works

  • Green, Garrett, trans. Allen Wood, ed. Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Breazeale, Daniel and Zöller, Günter. The System of Ethics According to the principles of the Wissenschaftslehre. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Neuhouser. Frederick and Baur, Michael. trans. and eds. Foundations of Natural Right. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. trans. and ed. Introductions to the Wissenschaftslehre and Other Writings. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1994.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. trans. and ed. Foundations of the Transcendental Philosophy (Wissenschaftslehre Nova Methodo, 1796-1799). Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1992.
  • Breazeale, Daniel. trans. and ed. Early Philosophical Writings. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1988.
  • Preuss, Peter, trans. The Vocation of Man. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1987.
  • Heath. Peter and Lachs, John, trans. Science of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
  • Jones, R. F. and Turnbull, George Henry, trans. Addresses to the German Nation. New York: Harper & Row, 1968.

c. Hegel

i. German Editions of Hegel’s Works

  • Eva Moldenhauer and Karl Markus Michel, eds. Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel: Werke. Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1971-1979.
  • Hoffmeister. Johannes, ed. Briefe von und an Hegel, Hamburg: Meiner, 1969.
  • Deutsche Forschungsgemeinschaft in Verbindung mit der Rheiniscb-westfalischen
  • Akademie der Wissenschaften, ed. Hegels Gesammelte Werke. Kritische Ausgabe. Hamburg: Meiner Verlag, 1968.

ii. English Translations of Hegel’s Works

1. Cambridge Hegel Translations
  • Di Giovanni, George, trans. and ed. The Science of Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Brinkmann, Klaus and Dahlstrom, Daniel O., trans. and ed. Encyclopaedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Basic Outline,  Part 1, Logic. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Bowman, Brady and and Speight, Allen. Heidelberg Writings. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
2. Other English Translations of Hegel’s Works
  • Nisbet, H.B., trans. Wood, Allen, ed. Elements of the Philosophy of Right. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 1991.
  • Geraets, Theodore F., Harris, H.S., and Suchting, Wallis Arthur, trans. The Encylopedia Logic. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1991.
  • Brown, Robert, ed. Lectures on the History of Philosophy. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1990.
  • Burbidge. John S., trans. The Jena System 1804/1805: Logic and Metaphysics. Montreal: McGill/Queen's University Press, 1986.
  • Miller, A.V., trans. George, Michael and Vincent, Andrew, eds. The Philosophical Propadeutic. Oxford: Blackwell, 1986.
  • Hodgson, Peter and Brown, R. F., trans. Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1984-1986.
  • Dobbins, John and Fuss, Peter, trans. Three Essays 1793-1795. South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984.
  • Cerf, Walter and Harris, H.S., trans. System of Ethical Life and First Philosophy of Spirit. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1979.
  • Petry, Michael John, trans. and ed. Hegels Philosophie des subjektiven Geistes/Hegel's Philosophy of Subjective Spirit. Dordrecht: Riedel, 1978.
  • Miller, A.V. Phenomenology of Spirit. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Cerf, Walter and Harris, H.S., trans. The Difference Between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1977.
  • Cerf, Walter and Harris, H.S., trans. Faith and Knowledge. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1977.
  • Nisbet, H.B., trans. Lectures on the Philosophy of World History: Introduction. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975.
  • Wallace. William, trans. Hegel's Philosophy of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1971.
  • Miller, A.V., trans. Philosophy of Nature. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1970.
  • Miller, A.V., trans. Science of Logic. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1969.
  • Knox, T.M. trans. Hegel's Aesthetics. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1964.

d. Schelling

i. German Editions of Schelling’s Works

  • Frank, Manfred and Kurz, Gerhard. eds. Materialien zu Schellings philosophischen Anfängen. Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1995.
  • Jacobs, Wilhelm G., Krings. Hermann, and Zeltner, Hermann, eds. F.W.J. von Schelling: Historisch-kritische Ausgabe. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1976-.
  • Fuhrmans, Horst, ed. Schelling: Briefe und Dokumente. Bonn: Bouvier, 1973·

ii. English Translations of Schelling’s Works

  • Love, Jeff and Schmitt, Johannes, trans. Philosophical Investigations into the Essence of Human Freedom. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2007.
  • Matthews, Bruce, trans. The Grounding of Positive Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2007.
  • Richey, Mason and Zisselsberger, Markus, trans. Historical-Critical Introduction to the Philosophy of Mythology. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2007.
  • Peterson, Keith R., trans. and ed. First Outline of a System of the Philosophy of Nature. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2004.
  • Steinkamp, Fiona, trans. Clara, or On Nature's Connection to the Spirit World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2002.
  • Wirth, Jason M., Trans. The Ages of the World. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Bowie, Andrew, trans. On the History of Modern Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994
  • Pfau, Thomas, trans. and ed. Idealism and the Endgame of Theory: Three Essays by F.W.J. Schelling. Albany: State University of New York Press, I994.
  • Stott, Douglas W., trans. The Philosophy of Art. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
  • Gutmann, James, trans. Philosophical Inquiries into the Nature of Human Freedom. La Salle: Open Court, 1989.
  • Harris, Errol and Heath. Peter, trans. Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Vater, Michael G., trans. Bruno, or On the Natural and the Divine Principle of Things Albany: State University of New York Press, 1984.
  • Marti, Fritz, trans. and ed. The Unconditional in Human Knowledge: Four Early Essays. Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press, 1980.
  • Heath, Peter, trans. System of Transcendental Idealism. Charlottesville, VA: University Press of Virginia, 1978.
  • Motgan, E. S. and Guterman, Norbert, trans. On University Studies. Athens: Ohio University Press, 1966.

e. Editions and Translations of Other Primary Sources

i. Jacobi

  • Hammacher, Klaus and Jaeschke, eds. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi: Werke. Hamburg: Meiner Verlag, 1998.
  • Di Giovanni, George, trans. and ed. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi: The: Main Philosophical Writings and the Novel Allwill. Montreal: McGill/Queen's University Press, 1994.
  • Klippen, Friedrich and von Roth, Friedrich, eds. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi: Werke. Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1968.

ii. Reinhold

  • Hebbeler, James, trans., and Ameriks, Karl, ed. Letters on the Kantian Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Fabbianelli, Faustino, ed. Beiträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnis der Philosophen. Hamburg: Meiner Verlag, 2003.
  • Di Giovanni, George and Harris, H.S. Between Kant and Hegel: Texts in the Development of Post-Kantian Idealism. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 2000.

iii. Hölderlin

  • Beissner, Friedrich, ed. Holderlin: Samtliche Werke, Grosser Stuttgarter Ausgabe. Stuttgart: Cotta, 1943-85.
  • Pfau, Thomas, trans. and ed. Essays and Letters on Theory, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1988.

iv. Kierkegaard, Søren

  • Cappelørn, N.J. et. al. Søren Kierkegaards Skrifter. Copenhagen: Gad, 1997.
  • Hong, Howard V. and Hong, Enda H., ed. Kierkegaard’s Writings. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983-2009.

v. Marx

  • Pascal, Roy, ed.The German Ideology, New York: International Publishers, 1947.
  • Ryawnov, D., and Adoratskii, Vladimir Viktorovich, eds. Karl Marx und Friedrich Engels: Historisch-Kritisch Gesamtausgabe. Redin: Dietz Verlag, 1956.

vi. Schopenhauer

  • Janaway, Christopher and Norman, Judith and Welchman Alistair, trans. and eds. The World as Will and Representation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Aquila, Richard and Carus, David, trans. The World as Will and Presentation. New York: Pearson Longman, 2008.
  • Payne, Eric F. and Zöller, Günter, trans. Prize Essay on the Freedom of the Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Payne. Eric F., trans. On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason. La Salle: Open Court, 1989.
  • Payne, Eric F., trans. The World as Will and Representation. New York: Dover, 1974.
  • Hübscher, Arthur, ed. Sammtliche Werke. Mannheirn: Brockhaus, 1988.

f. Other Works on German Idealism

  • Allison, Henry. Kant's Transcendental Idealism (2nd Edition) New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004.
  • Allison, Henry. Idealism and Freedom. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Ameriks, Karl, ed. The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Ameriks, Karl. Kant and the Fate of Autonomy: Problems in the Appropriation of the Critical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2.000.
  • Avineri, Shlomo. Hegel's Theory of the Modern State. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1972.
  • Baur, Michael and Dahlstrom, Daniel. eds. The Emergence of German Idealism. Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1999.
  • Beiser, Frederick. Hegel. London: Routledge, 2005.
  • Beiser, Frederick, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Hegel. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Beiser, Frederick. Enlightenment, Revolution, and Romanticism: The Genesis of Modern German Political Thought. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1992.
  • Beiser, Frederick The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1987.
  • Breazeale, Daniel and Rockmore, Thomas, eds. Fichte: Historical Contexts/Contemporary Controversies. Atlantic Highlands: Humanities Press, 1997.
  • Bowie, Andrew. Aesthetics and Subjectivity: From Kant to Nietzsche (2nd Edition). Manchester: Manchester University Press, 2000.
  • Bowie, Andrew. Schelling and Modern European Philosophy. London: Routledge, 1993.
  • Cassirer, Ernst. Kant's Life and Thought, trans. James Haden. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1981.
  • Croce, Benedetto. What is Living and What is Dead in the Philosophy of Hegel, trans. Douglas Ainslie. New York: Russell & Russell. 1969.
  • Di Giovanni, George, ed. Essays on Hegel's Logic. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Findlay, J.N. Hegel: A Re-examination. London: George Allen and Unwin, 1958.
  • Forster, Michael. Hegel's Idea of a Phenomenology of Spirit. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1998
  • Forster, Michael. Hegel and Skepticism. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1989.
  • Guyer, Paul, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Kant. Cambridge; Cambridge University Press, 1992.
  • Hammer, Espen, ed. German Idealism: Contemporary Perspectives. London: Routledge, 2007.
  • Harris, H.S. Hegel's Development: Night Thoughts. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Harris, H.S. Hegel's Development: Towards the Daylight. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • Henrich, Dieter. Between Kant and Hegel: Lectures on German Idealism. ed. David Pacini. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2003.
  • Houlgate, Stephen, ed. Hegel and the Arts. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2007.
  • Houlgate, Stephen. The Opening of Hegel’s Logic. West Lafayette: Purdue University Press, 2006.
  • Houlgate, Stephen, ed. Hegel and the Philosophy of Nature. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Hyppolite. Jean. Genesis and Structure of the Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. S. Cherniak and R. Heckmann. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1974.
  • Inwood, Michael. Hegel. London: Routledge, 1983.
  • Kojeve, Alexandre. Introduction to the Reading of Hegel, trans. J. H. Nichols. New York: Basic Books, 1960.
  • Kuehn, Manfred. Kant: A Life. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000
  • Longuenesse, Béatrice. Hegel’s Critique of Metaphysics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
  • Martin, Wayne. Idealism and Objectivity: Understanding Fichte's Jena Project. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
  • Neuhauser, Frederick. Fichte's Theory of Subjectivity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
  • O'Hondt, Jacques. Hegel in his Time. trans. John Burbidge. Peterborough: Broadview Press, 1988.
  • Pinkard, Terry. German Philosophy 1760-1860: The Legacy of Idealism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Pinkard, Terry. Hegel: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Pinkard, Terry. Hegel's Phenomenology: The Sociality of Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Pippin, Robert. Hegel on Self-Consciousness: Desire and Death in the Phenomenology of Spirit. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2010.
  • Pippin, Robert. Hegel’s Practical Philosophy: Rational Agency as ethical Life. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
  • Pippin, Robert. Hegel's Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Priest, Stephen, ed. Hegel's Critiqut of Kant. Oxford.: Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Redding, Paul. Analytic Philosophy and the Return to Hegelian Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Ritter, Joachim. Hegel and the French Revolution. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1982.
  • Rockmore, Tom. Before and After Hegel: A Historical Introduction to Hegel's Thought. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1993.
  • Sedgwick, Sally, ed. The Reception of Kant's Critical Philosophy: Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Snow, Dale. Schelling and the End of Idealism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Solomon, Robert M. and Higgins, Kathleen M., eds. The Age of German Idealism. London: Routledge, 1993.
  • Stern, Robert. Hegelian Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press. 2009.
  • Taylor, Charles. Hegel. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975
  • Westphal, Kenneth. Hegel's Epistemological Realism: A Study of the Aim and Method of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989.
  • White, Allen. Schelling: Introduction to the System of Freedom. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1983.
  • Wirth, Jason M., Ed. Schelling Now: Contemporary Readings. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2004.
  • Wood, Allen Kant's Ethical Thou.ght. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Wood, Allen. Hegel's Ethical Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
  • Zöller, Günter. Fichte's Transcendental Philosophy. The Original Duplicity of Intelligence and Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.


Author Information

Colin McQuillan
University of Tennessee Knoxville
U. S. A.

Goethe, Johann Wolfgang von

Johann Wolfgang von Goethe (1749-1832)

GoetheGoethe defies most labels, and in the case of the label ‘philosopher’ he did so intentionally. “The scholastic philosophy,” in his opinion, “had, by the frequent darkness and apparent uselessness of its subject- matter, by its unseasonable application of a method in itself respectable, and by its too great extension over so many subjects, made itself foreign to the mass, unpalatable, and at last superfluous” (Goethe 1902, 1: 294). But it is nothing exceptional for a philosopher to disdain the character of what is passed along under the name philosophy by professional academics. If Diogenes, Montaigne, Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, Sartre, or Rorty, can be considered philosophers, then it may even be a rule that to reject the appellation is a condition of having earned it. That said, Goethe is certainly not a philosopher in the sense made popular in his day: a builder of self-grounding systems of thought. Neither is he a philosopher by today’s most common definitions: either a professional analyzer of arguments or a critic of contemporary cultural practices. The paradigm under which Goethe might be classified a philosopher is much older, recalling the ancient and then renaissance conception of the polymath, the man of great learning and wisdom, whose active life serves as the outward expression of his thinking.

In terms of influence, Goethe’s upon Germany is second only to Martin Luther’s. The periods of his dramatic and poetic writing –Sturm und Drang, romanticism, and classicism— simply are the history of the high-culture in Germany from the late eighteenth to the early nineteenth century. Philosophically, his influence is indelible, though not as wide-reaching. His formulation of an organic ontology left its mark on thinkers from Hegel to Wittgenstein; his theory of colors challenged the reigning paradigm of Newton’s optics; and his theory of morphology, that of Linnaeus’ biology.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Philosophical Background
  3. Scientific Background and Influence
  4. Morphology, Compensation, and Polarity
  5. Theory of Colors
  6. Philosophical Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. German Editions of Goethe’s Works
      2. Letters and Conversations
      3. English Translations of Goethe’s Works
    2. Selected Secondary Scholarship
      1. Historical and Philosophical Context
      2. Science and Methodology
      3. Aesthetics, Politics, and Theology

1. Life and Works

Historical studies should generally avoid the error of thinking that the circumstances of a philosopher’s life necessitate their theoretical conclusions. With Goethe, however, his poetry, scientific investigations, and philosophical worldview are manifestly informed by his life, and are indeed intimately connected with his lived experiences. In the words of Georg Simmel, “…Goethe’s individual works gradually appear to take on less significance than his life as a whole. His life does not acquire the sense of a biography that strings together external phenomena, but is rather like the portrait of a singular vastness, depth and dynamism of existence, the pure expression of an internal vigor in its relation to the world, the spiritualization of an extraordinary sphere of reality,” (Simmel 2007, 85f).

Johann Wolfgang von Goethe was born August 28, 1749 in Frankfurt, Germany. His father was the Imperial Councillor Johann Kaspar Goethe (1710-1782) and his mother Katharina Elisabeth (Textor) Goethe (1731-1808). Goethe had four siblings, only one of whom, Cornelia, survived early childhood.

Goethe's early education was inconsistently directed by his father and sporadic tutors. He did, however, learn Greek, Latin, French, and Italian relatively well by the age of eight. In part to satisfy his father’s hope for material success, Goethe enrolled in law at Leipzig in 1765. There he gained a reputation within theatrical circles while attending the courses of C.F. Gellert. And there he gained notoriety for his extracurricular activities at what would become Faust’s haunt, Auerbach’s Keller. In 1766 he fell in love with Anne Catharina Schoenkopf (1746-1810) and wrote his joyfully exuberant collection of nineteen anonymous poems, dedicated to her simply with the title Annette.

After a case of tuberculosis and two years convalescence, Goethe moved to Stassburg in 1770 to finish his legal degree. There he met Johann Gottfried Herder (1744-1803), unofficial leader of the Sturm und Drang movement. Herder encouraged Goethe to read Homer, Ossian, and Shakespeare, whom the poet credits above all with his first literary awakening. Inspired by a new flame, this time Friederike Brion, he published the Neue Lieder (1770) and his Sesenheimer Lieder (1770-1771). Though set firmly on the path to poetry, he was promoted Licentitatus Juris in 1771 and returned to Frankfurt where with mixed success he opened a small law practice. Seeking greener pastures, he soon after moved to the more liberal city of Darmstadt. Along the road, so the story goes, Goethe obtained a copy of the biography of a noble highwayman from the German Peasants' War. Within the astounding span of six weeks, he had reworked it into the popular anti-establishment protest, Götz von Berlichingen (1773).

His next composition, Die Leiden des jungen Werther (1774), brought Goethe nearly instant worldwide acclaim. The plot of the book is mostly a synthesis of his friendships with Charlotte Buff (1753-1828) and her fiancé Johann Christian Kestner (1741-1800), and the suicide of Goethe’s friend Karl Wilhelm Jerusalem (1747-1772). It remains the archetype of the Sturm und Drang’s elevation of emotion over reason, disdain for social proprieties, and exhortation for action in place of reflection. Besides Werther, Goethe composed Die Hymnen (among them Ganymed, Prometheus and Mahomets Gesang), and several shorter dramas, among them Götter, Helden und Wieland (1774), and Clavigo (1774).

On the strength of his reputation, Goethe was invited in 1775 to the court of then eighteen-year-old Duke Carl August (1757-1828), who would later become Grand Duke of Saxe-Weimar-Eisenach. Although Weimar was then a village of only six thousand residents, it was in the process of a cultural revolution thanks to the foresight and aesthetic vision of Duchess Anna Amalia (1739-1807), mother of the Duke and matron of the “Court of the Muses.” Goethe became enveloped in court life, where he could turn his limitless curiosity to an astonishing range of civic activities. As court-advisor and special counsel to the Duke, he took directorship of the mining concern, the finance ministry, the war  and roads commission, the local theater, not to mention construction of the beautiful Park-am-Ilm. He was eventually granted nobility by Emperor Joseph II, and became Geheimrat of Weimar in 1782.

From 1786 to 1788 Goethe took his Italienische Resie, in part out of his growing enthusiasm for the Winckelmannian rebirth of classicism. There he met the artists Kaufmann and Tischbein, and also Christiane Vulpius (1765–1816), with whom he held a rather scandalous love affair until their eventual marriage in 1806.

Although Goethe had first met Friedrich Schiller (1759-1805) in 1779, when the latter was a medical student in Karlsruhe, there was hardly an immediate friendship between them. When Schiller came to Weimar in 1787, Goethe dismissively considered Schiller an impetuous though undeniably talented upstart. As Goethe wrote to his friend Körner in 1788, “His entire being is just set up differently than mine; our intellectual capacities appear essentially at odds.” After some years of maturation on Schiller’s part and of mellowing on Goethe’s, the two found their creative spirits in harmony. In 1794, the pair became intimate friends and collaborators, and began nothing less than the most extraordinary period of literary production in German history. Working alongside Schiller, Goethe finally completed his Bildungsroman, the great Wilhelm Meisters Lehrjahre (1795-6), as well as his epic Hermann und Dorothea (1796-7) and several balladic pieces. Schiller, for his part, completed the Wallenstein trilogy (1799), Maria Stuart (1800), Die Jungfrau von Orleans (1801), Die Braut von Messina (1803) and Wilhelm Tell (1804). To Goethe’s great sorrow and regret, Schiller died at the height of his powers on April 29, 1805. Of their collaboration’s historical importance, Alfred Bates commemorates, “Schiller and Goethe have ever been inseparable in the minds of their countrymen, and have reigned as twin stars in the literary firmament. If Schiller does not hold the first place he is more beloved, though Goethe is more admired,” (Bates 1906, 11: 75).

Johann Wolfgang von Goethe died on March 22, 1832 in Weimar, having finally finished Faust the previous year. His famous last words were a request that his servant let in “more light.” The prince of poets, Goethe was laid to rest in the Fürstengruft of the Historischer Friedhof in Weimar, side by side with his friend Schiller.

2. Philosophical Background

The Kultfigur of Goethe as the unspoiled and uninfluenced genius is doubtless over-romanticized. Goethe himself gave rise to this myth, both in his conversations with others and in his own quasi-biographical work, Dichtung und Wahrheit (1811-1833). About his study of the history of philosophy, he writes, “one doctrine or opinion seemed to me as good as another, so far, at least, as I was capable of penetrating into it,” (Goethe 1902, 182). Albert Schweitzer, usually even-handed in his attributions, writes, “Goethe borrows nothing from any of the philosophies with which he is in contact. Thanks, however, to his conscientious study of the thought of others, he attains an ever clearer grasp of his own ideas,” (Schweitzer 1949, 70).

Goethe’s way of reading was neither that of the scholar seeking out arguments to analyze nor that of the historian curious about the ideas of the great minds. No disciple of any particular philosopher or system, he instead borrows in a syncretic way from a number of different and even opposing thought systems in the construction of his Weltanschauung. And whenever particular subjects could not be put to practical use, Goethe’s attention quickly moved on. In a rather telling recollection, Goethe characterizes his philosophy lectures thusly, “At first I attended my lectures assiduously and faithfully, but the philosophy would not enlighten me at all. In logic it seemed strange to me that I had so to tear asunder, isolate, and, as it were, destroy, those operations of the mind which I had performed with the greatest ease from my youth upwards, and this in order to see into the right use of them. Of the thing itself, of the world, and of God, I thought I knew about as much as the professor himself; and, in more places than one, the affair seemed to me to come into a tremendous strait. Yet all went on in tolerable order till towards Shrovetide, when, in the neighborhood of Professor Winkler's house on the Thomas Place, the most delicious fritters came hot out of the pan just at the hour of lecture,” (Goethe 1902, 205). Philosophy apparently held just slightly less interest than good pastry. Notwithstanding this estimation, indelible philosophical influences are nevertheless discernible.

For many intellectuals in Goethe’s generation, Rousseau (1712-78) represented the struggle against the Cartesian mechanistic world view. Rousseau’s elevation of the emotional and instinctual aspects of human subjectivity galvanized the traditional German Wanderlust into a far reaching cry to ‘return to nature’ in terms of a longing for pre-civilized society and pre-Enlightenment efforts to harmonize with rather than conquer nature. Goethe felt this unity with nature keenly in his Sturm und Drang period, something equally evident in Werther’s desire for aesthetic wholeness and in his emotional outbursts. From 1784 to 1804, there is a notable decline in enthusiasm for Rousseau’s privileging emotion over reason, though never an explicit rejection. Some scholars attribute this to Goethe’s participation in the sorts of civic bureaucracies that Rousseau so lamented in modern life. But it is clear that there are philosophical reasons besides these practical ones. Goethe’s classical turn in these years is marked by his view that the fullest life was one that balanced passion and duty, creativity and regulation. Only through the interplay of these oppositions, which Rousseau never came to recognize, could one attain classical perfection.

Although educated in a basically Leibnizian-Wolffian worldview, it was Spinoza (1632-77) from whom Goethe adopted the view that God is both immanent with the world and identical with it. While there is little to suggest direct influence on other aspects of his thought, there are certain curious similarities. Both think that ethics should consist in advice for influencing our characters and eventually to making us more perfect individuals. And both hold that happiness means an inner, almost stoically tranquil superiority over the ephemeral troubles of the world.

Kant (1724-1804) was doubtless the most famous living philosopher of Goethe’s youth. Yet Goethe only came to read him seriously in the late 1780s, and even then only with the help of Karl Reinhold (1757-1823). While he shared with Kant the rejection of externally imposed norms of ethical behavior, his reception was highly ambivalent. In a commemoration for Wieland (1773-1813) he asserts that the Kritik der reinen Vernunft (1781/7) is “a dungeon which restrains our free and joyous excursions into the field of experience.” Like Aristotle before him, Goethe felt the only proper starting point for philosophy was the direct experience of natural objects. Kant’s foray into the transcendental conditions of the possibility of such an experience seemed to him an unnecessary circumvention of precisely that which we are by nature equipped to undertake. The critique of reason was like a literary critique: both could only pale in value to the original creative activity. Concerning Kant’s Kritik der praktischen Vernunft (1788), Goethe was convinced that dicta of pure practical reason, no matter how convincing theoretically, had little power to transform character. Perhaps with Kant’s ethics in mind, he wrote, “Thinking is easy, acting is difficult, and to put one's thoughts into action is the most difficult thing in the world.” And “Knowing is not enough; we must apply. Willing is not enough; we must do.” On the other hand, a letter to Eckermann of April 11, 1827, indicates that he considers Kant to be the most eminent of modern philosophers. And he certainly appreciated Kant's Kritik der Urteilskraft (1790) for having shown that nature and art each have their ends within themselves purposively rather than as final causes imposed from without.

Influenced in part by Herder’s conception of Einfühlen, Goethe formulated his own morphological method (see below). More the Kantian than Goethe, Herder’s belief in Über den Ursprung der Sprache (1772) that language could be explained naturalistically as a creative impulse within human development rather than a divine gift influenced Goethe’s theoretical work on poetry. And the trace of Herder’s claims about the equal worth of historical epochs and cultures can still be seen in the eclectic art collection in Goethe’s house on Weimar’s Frauenplan.

3. Scientific Background and Influence

Goethe considered his scientific contributions as important as his literary achievements. While few scholars since have shared that contention, there is no doubting the sheer range of Goethe’s scientific curiosity. In his youth, Goethe’s poetry and dramatic works featured the romantic belief in the ‘creative energy of nature’ and evidenced a certain fascination with alchemy. But court life in Weimar brought Goethe for the first time in contact with experts outside his literary comfort zone. His directorship of the silver-mine at nearby Ilmenau introduced him to a group of mineralogists from the Freiburg Mining Academy, led by Johann Carl Voigt (1752-1821). His 1784 discovery of the intermaxillary bone was a result of his study with Jena anatomist Justus Christian Loder (1753-1832). Increasingly fascinated by botany, he studied the pharmacological uses of plants under August Karl Batsch (1761-1802) at the University of Jena, and began an extensive collection of his own. He grew dissatisfied with the system of Linnaeus as an artificial taxonomy of plants, considering it “a shade of a great harmony, which one must study as a whole, otherwise each individual is a dead letter,” (Letter to Knebel, 17 November, 1784).

There is a passionate ambivalence about Goethe’s scientific reputation. He has alternately been received as a universal man of learning whose methods and intuitions have contributed positively to many aspects of scientific discourse, or else denounced as a dilettante incapable of understanding the figures— Linnaeus and Isaac Newton—against whom his work is a feeble attempt to revolt. Goethe’s scientific treatises were neglected by many in the nineteenth century as the amateurish efforts of an otherwise great poet, one who should have stayed within the arena that best suited him. Positivists of the early twentieth century virtually ignored him. Erich Heller claims Goethe “made no contribution to scientific progress or technique,” (Heller 1952, 7). On the other hand, some of the great scientific minds have expressed enthusiastic respect and even approval of Goethe’s contributions, among them Helmholtz, Einstein, and Planck (Cf. Stephenson 1995).

4. Morphology, Compensation, and Polarity

In Goethe’s day, the reigning systematic botanical theory in Europe was that of Carl Linnaeus (1707-1778). Plants were classified according to their relation to each other into species, genera, and kingdom. As an empirical method, Linnaeus’s taxonomy ordered external characteristics — size, number, and location of individual organs — as generic traits. The problem for Goethe was two-fold. Although effective as an organizational schema, it failed to distinguish organic from inorganic natural objects. And by concentrating only on the external characteristics of the plant, it ignored the inner development and transformation characteristic of living things generally. Goethe felt that the exposition of living objects required the same account of inner nature as it did for the account of the inner unity of a person.

Goethe believed that all living organisms bore an inner physiognomic ‘drive to formation’ or Bildungstrieb. In his “First Sketch of a General Introduction into Comparative Anatomy, Starting from Osteology” (1795), Goethe discussed a law binding the action of the Bildungstrieb, that “nothing can be added to one part without subtracting from another, and conversely,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 237). This notion of ‘compensation’ bears a likeness to the laws of vital force put forward by Johann Friedrich Blumenbach (1752-1840) and Carl Friedrich Kielmeyer (1765-1844) in the early 1790s. But whereas their versions dealt with the generation and corruption of living beings, Goethe sought the common limitations imposed on organic beings by external nature.

Whereas his earlier romanticism considered nature the raw material on which human emotions could be imparted, Goethe’s studies in botany, mineralogy, and anatomy revealed to him certain common patterns in the development and modifications of natural forms. The name he gave to this new manner of inquiry was ‘morphology’. No static concept, morphology underwent its own metamorphosis throughout Goethe’s career. Morphology is first named as such in Goethe’s notes of 1796. But he only fully lays out the position as an account of the form and transformation of organisms in the 1817 Zur Morphologie. He continued to publish articles in his journal “On Science in General, On Morphology in Particular” from 1817 to 1824. Goethe’s key contention here is that every living being undergoes change according to a compensatory dynamic between the successive stages of its development. In the plant, for example, this determination of each individual member by the whole arises insofar as every organ is built according to the same basic form. As he wrote to Herder on May 17, 1787:

It has become apparent to me that within the organ that we usually address as ‘leaf’ there lies hidden the true Proteus that can conceal and manifest itself in every shape. Any way you look at it, the plant is always only leaf, so inseparably joined with the future germ that one cannot think the one without the other. […]With this model and the key to it, one can then go on inventing plants forever that must follow lawfully; which, even if they don’t exist, still could exist…

Goethe’s morphology, in opposition to the static taxonomy of Linnaeus, studied these perceptible limitations not merely in order to classify plants in a tidy fashion, but as instances of natural generation for the sake of intuiting the inner working of nature itself, whole and entire. Since all organisms undergo a common succession of internal forms, we can intuitively uncover within these changes an imminent ideal of development, which Goethe names the ‘originary phenomenon’ or Urphänomen. These pure exemplars of the object in question are not some abstracted Platonic Idea of the timeless and unchanging essence of the thing, but “the final precipitate of all experiences and experiments, from which it can ever be isolated. Rather it reveals itself in a constant succession of manifestations,” (Goethe 1981, 13: 25). The Urphänomen thus offer a sort of “guiding thread through the labyrinth of diverse living forms,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 58), which thereby reveals the true unity of the forms of nature in contrast to the artificially static and lifeless images of Linneaus’ system. Through the careful study of natural objects in terms of their development, and in fact only in virtue of it, we are able to intuit morphologically the underlying pattern of what the organic object is and must become. “When, having something before me that has grown, I inquire after its genesis and measure the process as far back as I can, I become aware of a series of stages, which, though I cannot actually see them in succession, I can present to myself in memory as a kind of ideal whole,” (Goethe 1947ff, I/10: 131).

The morphological method is thus a combination of careful empirical observation and a deeper intuition into the idea that guides the pattern of changes over time as an organism interacts with its environment. Natural observation is the necessary first step of science; but because the senses can only attend to outer forms, a full account of the object also requires an intuition that apprehends an object with the ‘eyes of the mind’. Morphology reveals, “the laws of transformation according to which nature produces one part through another and achieves the most diversified forms through the modification of a single organ,” (Goethe 1961-3, 17: 22). While the visible transformations are apparent naturalistically, the inner laws by which they are necessary are not. They are, in Goethe’s word, dämonisch, apparent intuitively but unable to be explicated more concretely by means of the understanding.

Whereas Linneaus’ taxonomy only considered the sensible qualities of the object, Goethe believed a sufficient explanation must address that object in terms of organic wholeness and development. To do that, the scientist needs to describe the progressive modification of a single part of an object as its modification over time relates to the whole of which it is the part. Considering the leaf as an example of this Urphänomen, Goethe traced its metamorphosis from a seed into the stem, then leaves, then flowers, and finally its stamen or pistil. This continuous development was described by Goethe as an ‘intensification’ or Steigerung of the original form.

The oppositional tension between the creative force and the compensatory limitations within all living things exemplifies the notion of ‘polarity’ or Polarität. In his 1790 essay, “The Metamorphosis of Plants,” Goethe represented the intensification of a plant as the result of the interaction between the nutritive forces of the plant and the organic form of the primal leaf. Polarity between a freely creative impulse and an objectively structuring law is what allows the productive restraint of pure creativity and at the same time the playfulness and innovation of formal rules. Polarity also plays a marked role in Goethe’s Farbenlehre (see below), as the principle of interplay between light and darkness out of which the Urphänomen of color is exhibited. “With light poise and counterpoise, nature oscillates within her prescribed limits, yet thus arise all the varieties and conditions of the phenomena which are presented to us in space and time,” (Goethe 1970, xxxix).

Goethe’s theories of morphology, polarity, and compensation each have their roots in his dramatic and poetic writings. But rather than a fanciful application of an aesthetic doctrine to the nature, Goethe believed that the creativity great artists, insofar as they are great, was a reflection of the purposiveness of nature. After all, “masterpieces were produced by man in accordance with the same true and natural laws as the masterpieces of nature,” (Goethe 1961-3, 11: 435–6). Goethe’s classicism features a similarly polarized intertwining of the unbridled creativity of the artistic drives and the formal rules of technique. As with a plant, the creative forces of life must be guided, trained, and restricted, so that in place of something wild and ungainly can stand a balanced structure which achieves, in both organic nature and in the work of art, its full intensification in beauty. As the work of the botanist is to trace the morphology of an individual according to an ideal Urphänomen, so does it fall to the classical author to intensify his characters within the contextualized polarity of the plot in a way simultaneously unique and yet typical. The early drafts of Torquato Tasso (begun in the 1780s), for example, reveal its protagonist as a veritable force of nature, pouring out torrential feelings upon a conservative and repressed external world. By the time of the published version in 1790, the Sturm und Drang character of Tasso is polarized against the aristocratically reposed and reasonable character of Antonio. Only in conjunction with Antonio can Tasso come into classical fullness and perfection. As the interplay of polarities in nature is the principle of natural wholeness, so is it the principle of equipoise in the classical drama. Polarities are also visible in Wilhelm Meister’s Lehrjahr (1795-6). Again in marked contrast to an earlier version of the text, in the final version Wilhelm’s romantic love of art and theatre is now just one piece of his coming-into-himself, which requires its polar opposite: the restraint inculcated within a conservatively aristocratic society. Only from the polarized tension does his drive to self-formation achieve intensification and eventually classical perfection.

5. Theory of Colors

“As to what I have done as a poet... I take no pride in it... but that in my century I am the only person who knows the truth in the difficult science of colors – of that, I say, I am not a little proud, and here I have a consciousness of a superiority to many,” (Goethe 1930, 302). Coming from the preeminent literary figure of his age, Goethe’s remarkable statement reveals to what extent he considered the Farbenlehre (1810) his life’s true work. At the same time, it was the source of perhaps his greatest disappointment. Like his work on morphology, his theory of colors fell on mostly deaf ears.

As his morphology targeted the system of Linnaeus, Goethe’s Farbenlehre challenged what was then and among the general public still remains the leading view of optics, that of Isaac Newton (1642-1727). However, most of Goethe’s vitriol was not directed at Newton himself, but the dismissive attitudes of his adherents, who would not so much as entertain the possibility that their conceptual framework was inadequate. He compares Newton’s optics, “to an old castle, which was at first constructed by its architect with youthful precipitation […] The same system was pursued by his successors and heirs: their increased wants within, and harassing vigilance of their opponents without, and various accidents compelled them in some place to build nearby, in others in connection with the fabric, and thus to extend the original plan,” (Goethe 1970, xlii). Thus, while Goethe esteems Newton as a redoubtable genius, his issue is with those half-witted apologists who effectively corrupted that very same edifice they fought to defend. His aim is accordingly to, “dismantle it from gable and roof downwards; so that the sun may at last shine into the old nest of rats and owls…” (Goethe 1970, xliii).

As was the case with Linnaeus, Goethe’s guiding criticism of Newton concerned his ostensibly artificial method. Through Newton’s famous experiments with prismatic phenomenon, he discovered that pure light already contained within itself all the colors available to the human visual spectrum. The refraction of pure white light projected at a prism produces the seven individual colors. Pragmatically, this allowed Newton to quantify the angular bending of light beams and to predict which colors would be produced at a given frequency. That frequency could be calculated simply by accounting for the distance between the light source and the prism and again the distance from the prism to the surface upon which the color was projected.

But by reducing the thing itself to its perceptible qualities, the Newtonians had made a grave methodological mistake. The derivative colors produced by the prismatic experiments are identified with the spectrum that appears in the natural world. But since the light has been artificially manipulated to fit the constraints of the experiment, there is no prima facie reason to think that natural light would feature the same qualities. Sending a beam of light through a turbid prismatic medium ─ one among a nearly infinite variety of media ─ produced a reliably quantifiable set of results, but by no means either the only or even an obviously preferable set. In Goethe’s words, “[Newton] commits the error of taking as his premise a single phenomenon, artificial at that, building a hypothesis on it, and attempting to explain with it the most numerous and unlimited phenomena,” (Goethe 1981, 13: 50).

Goethe’s alternative relies upon his ideas of morphology and polarity. Just as the study of a plant had to proceed from the empirical observation of a great variety of particulars in order to intuit the Urphänomen that was common to all of them, so too should a Farbenlehre proceed from as great a variety of natural observations as possible. Whereas Newton universalizes from a controlled and artificial experiment, Goethe thinks “[i]t is useless to attempt to express the nature of a thing abstractedly. Effects we can perceive, and a complete history of those effects would, in fact, sufficiently define the nature of the thing itself. We should try in vain to describe a man’s character, but let his acts be collected and an idea of the character will be presented to us. The colors are acts of lights; its active and passive modifications: thus considered we may expect from them some explanation respecting life itself,” (Goethe 1970, xxxvii). These ‘acts’ of light reveal the same coordinate tension found in the rest of polarized nature. A light beam is no static thing with a substantial ontological status, but an oppositional tension that we perceive only relationally. Through careful observation of their interplay alone do we apprehend color. As defined by Goethe, “color is an elementary phenomenon in nature adapted to the sense of vision; a phenomenon which, like all others, exhibits itself by separation and contrast, by commixture and union, by augmentation and neutralization, by communication and dissolution: under these general terms its nature may be best comprehended,” (Goethe 1970, liv). Color arises from the polarity of light and darkness. Darkness is not the absence of light, as both Newton and most contemporary theorists believe, but its essential antipode, and thereby an integral part of color.

Through a series of experiments on his thesis that color is really the interplay of light and dark, Goethe discovered a peculiarity that seemed to confute the Newtonian system. If Newton is right that color is the result of dividing pure light, then there should be only one possible order to the spectrum, according to the frequency of the divided light. But there are clearly two ways to produce a color spectrum: with a light beam projected in a dark room, and with a shadow projected within a lighted room. Something bright, seen through something turbid, appears yellow. If the turbidity of the medium gradually increases, then what had appeared as yellow passes over into yellowish-red and eventually into bright-red as its frequency proportionally decreases. Something dark, seen through something turbid, appears blue; with a decreasing turbity, it appears violent. The color produced also depends upon the color of the material on which the light or shadow is cast. If a white light is projected above a dark boundary, the light extends a blue-violet edge into the dark area. A shadow projected above a light boundary, on the other hand, yields a red-yellow edge. When the distances between the projection and the surface are increased, the boundaries will eventually overlap. Done in a lighted room, the result of the overlap is green. The same procedure conducted in a dark room, however, produces magenta. If Newton was correct that only the bending of the light beam affects the given color, then neither the relative brightness of the room, the color of the background, nor the introduction of shadow should have altered the resultant color.

Reversing the artificial conditions of Newton’s original experiment, Goethe reformulated the problem of color to account for the role of both the observer and his or her context. Alongside the physical issues involved with optics, Goethe thus also realized the aesthetic conditions in the human experience of color. The perceptual capacities of the brain and eye, and their situatedness in a real world of real experience must be considered essential conditions of how colors could be seen. But while his observations of the double color-spectrum are intriguing, Goethe’s physiognomic speculations as to how the subject renders perceptual experience are, even by his contemporary standards, quite amateur. His reification of darkness, moreover, remains difficult to conceptualize coherently, much less to accept.

Although almost entirely ignored in his own time, and even undermined by his once and former collaborator, Schopenhauer, Goethe’s theory did win some later acclaim. His call to recognize the role of the subject in the perception of color does have positive echoes in the neo-Kantian theories of perception of Lange, Helmholtz, and Boscovich. Traces can also be found in twentieth century thinkers as divergent as Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty. Despite the fact that almost no serious thinker has ever counted themselves a strict adherent of Goethe’s Farbenlehre, the theory has had a remarkable persistence. Part of the explanation for this may be the obvious superiority of Goethe’s prose; his text is one of very few scientific treatises that can be read by amateurs with pleasure. Part is also due to decline of Newtonian physics generally.

6. Philosophical Influence

Goethe’s general influence on European culture is gargantuan. In 19th century Germany alone, authors like Heine, Novalis, Jean Paul, Tieck, Hoffman, and Eichendorff all owe tremendous debts to Götz and Werther. Thomas Carlyle, Ralph Waldo Emerson, Mark Twain, Kurt Tucholsky, Thomas Mann, James Joyce and too many others to name have since paid tribute to the master from Weimar. Composers like Mozart, Liszt, and Mahler dedicated works to Goethe’s drama, while Beethoven himself mused that the greatest musical accomplishment possible would be a perfect musical expression Faust. Goethe’s ideas have truly launched a thousand ships upon their cultural and intellectual expeditions. Philosophically, the lineage is comparatively more defined.

In his mature years, Goethe was to witness the philosophical focus in Germany shift from Kant to the Idealists. But by the early 1800s, Goethe was too convinced of the worth of his own ideas to be much influenced by what he considered philosophical fashions. Despite his proximity to and considerable influence at the University of Jena, Goethe had little positive contact with Fichte (1762-1814), who arrived there in 1794. Neither Fichte’s Pecksniffian sermonizing nor nearly illegible compositional style would have endeared him personally to the poet. Goethe’s more ambivalent attitude toward Schelling (1775-1854) vacillated between an approval of his appreciation for the deep mysteriousness of nature and an aversion to his futile attempt to solve it by means of an abstracted and artificial system. Schelling’s Naturphilosophie, like Goethe’s morphology, views nature as a constant organic development. But where Goethe saw polarity as an essential part of growth, Schelling understood dualities generally as something to be overcome in the intuition of the ‘absolute’.

Goethe’s relationship with Hegel (1770-1831) was both more direct and more influential. Most overtly, Hegel’s logic draws upon Goethe’s conception of metamorphosis. A letter from Hegel to Goethe on February 20, 1821 reads:

The simple and abstract, what you quite aptly call the archetypal phenomenon, this you put first, and then show the concrete phenomena as arising through the participation of still other influences and circumstances, and you direct the whole process in such a way that the sequence proceeds from the simple determining factors to the composite ones, and, thus arranged, something complex appears in all its clarity through this decomposition. To seek out the archetypal phenomenon, to free it from other extraneous chance surroundings — to grasp it abstractly, as we call it — this I consider to be a task for a great spiritual sense for nature, just as I consider that procedure altogether to be what is truly scientific in gaining knowledge in this field.

For Hegel, famously, a natural object has achieved its greatest perfection when it brings forth its full implicit content in explicit conceptual representation. Because the intellectual world ranks higher than the material, a phenomenology of the whole must observe the gradual unfolding of all possible logical forms from mere sense certainty through the self-recognition of consciousness to absolute knowing. To no small degree, Hegel’s criticism of Kant’s lifeless schematism of the understanding was foreshadowed by Goethe, who wrote, “Reason has to do with becoming, understanding with what has become. The former does not bother with the question, ‘what use?’; the latter does not ask ‘whence?’. Reason takes pleasure in development; understanding wishes to hold everything fixed so that it can exploit it,” (Goethe 1907, 555). Hegel’s formulation of Begriff, which designates the inner plan of the development of an object, was not wholly unlike Goethe’s Urphänomen (see below). The Hegelian dialectic, as an unveiling the movement of the concept would then correspond to the morphology. The problem, for Goethe, was that Hegel’s attempt to articulate wholeness began by the analysis of the logical concept of Being in the Logik and by the sublimation of the sense-certain observation of natural objects in the Phänomenologie, which for Goethe unjustifiably overlooks precisely that which it was the task of science to understand: the development of the natural forms of life, of which the mind is certainly a central one, but indeed only one example. As Goethe writes in a letter to Soret on February 13, 1829, “Nature is always true, always serious, always severe; it is always right, and mistakes and errors are always the work of men.” Similar to his critique of Kant, then, Goethe accused Hegel of creating a grand and abstract system to explain a phenomenon which in both ordinary life and in scientific observation could simply be assumed. Nature presents itself to the epistemologically reflective and to the naïve equally and without preference.

Arthur Schopenhauer’s (1788-1860) mother Johanna became fast friends with Goethe and his lover Christiane Vulpius when she moved to Weimra in 1804. His sister Adele was the lifelong confident of Ottile Pogwisch, who married Goethe’s and Christiane’s son Auguste. But for the young Arthur, due in part to an unavoidable clash of personalities, the established Goethe had little patience. Goethe recognized his intelligence early on, but declined to provide him a letter of recommendation to the university at Göttingen and offered him only a tepid letter of introduction to the classicist Friedrich August Wolf in Berlin. Schopenhauer’s dissertation, however, interested Goethe very much. In the winter of 1813-4, Goethe and Schopenhauer were engaged in extensive philosophical conversation concerning the former’s anti-Newtonian Farbenlehre (see below), out of which grew the latter’s Über das Sehen und die Farben in 1815. When Schopenhauer sent him the manuscript in the hopes of a recommendation, he grew impatient with the elder’s reticence to take his efforts sufficiently seriously. In truth, Schopenhauer’s work largely revealed Goethe’s as a failed attempt to overcome Newtonian visual theory, a fact which wounded Goethe deeply. Goethe followed Schopenhauer’s career with interest, however, and generally praised Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung. It remains a question, though, whether Goethe ever read the book carefully since scant reference to its ideas can be found.

Like that of his Erzieher Schopenhauer, Nietzsche’s (1844-1900) relationship with Goethe’s thought was deeply ambivalent. Nietzsche often admired Goethe as emblematic of a healthy, fully-formed individual. Goethe is said to be “the last German for whom I feel reverence,” (Nietzsche, Twilight of the Idols, “Skirmishes of an Untimely Man,” section 51). Nietzsche’s early contention that the tragic age of culture began only with the fortuitous interaction of the Apollonian and Dionysian drives bears a similarity to Goethe’s classical understanding of art as a tensional polarity between the blindly creative will and the constraint of formal rules. Yet Nietzsche takes Goethe to task for having invested too much in Winckelmann’s attribution of ‘Heiterkeit’ to classical antiquity and thereby for having ignored its deeply irrational underside. Moreover, Nietzsche’s ontology, if indeed he had one, is like Goethe’s in its rejection of static atomic substances and in its attempt to conceive an intrinsically agonistic process of becoming as the true character of the world. Similar, too, to Goethe’s ‘intensification’ principle, Nietzsche’s notoriously ambiguous ‘Will to Power’ characterizes the dynamic process by which entities ‘become what they are’ by struggling against oppositional limitations that are at the same time the necessary condition for growth. Due to this shared ontological outlook, Goethe and Nietzsche both thought contemporary science was constricted by an outdated conception of substance and, as a result, mechanistic modes of explanation should be reformulated to account for the dynamic character of nature. Despite these commonalities, Nietzsche jettisoned Goethe’s Bildungstrieb for an overarching drive–not to expression or growth within formal constraint—but for overcoming, for power.

Finally, Wittgenstein’s (1889-1951) claim that things which cannot be put into propositional form might nevertheless be shown bears a family resemblance to Goethe’s formulation of the daimonisch. But where Wittgenstein removes the proverbial ladder on which he ascends to his intuitions about the relation between logic and the world, thereby reducing what cannot be bound by the rules of logic as nonsensical, Goethe believed he could communicate what were admittedly ineffable Urphänomene in a non-propositional way, through the feelings evoked by drama. There is, moreover, a distinct similarity in Goethe’s and Wittgenstein’s views on the proper task of philosophy. Its aim, for both, can never be accomplished, once and for all, by means of ‘the right argument’. Argumentation, explanation, and demonstration only go so far in their attempt to unravel the mysteries of the world. “Philosophy simply puts everything before us; it fails to deduce anything,” (Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, 126).

Philosophy’s role in our life should guide us to be reflective people, ever ready to critique inherited dogmas, and always ready to revise our hypotheses in light of new observations. Goethe, through his ceaseless energy, limitless fascination with the world as it was presented to him, and his perpetual willingness to test his convictions against new evidence, carries a timeless appeal to philosophers, not because he demonstrated or explained what it meant to live philosophically, but because, through the example of the course of his life, he showed it.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

i. German Editions of Goethe’s Works

  • Akademie-Ausgabe: Werke, edited under the Institut für Deutsche Sprache und Literatur der Deutschen Akademie der Wissenschaften zu Berlin (Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, 1952ff).
  • Berliner Ausgabe: Poetische Werke. Kunsttheoretische Schriften und Übersetzungen, edited by the Bearbeiter-Kollektiv unter Leitung von Siegfried Seidel et al., 22 Volumes (Berlin/Weimar: Aufbau-Verlag, 1965-78).
  • Die Schriften zur Naturwissenschaft, edited by Kuhn et al. (Weimar: Deutschen Akademie der Naturforscher, 1947ff).
  • DTV-Gesamtausgabe: Sämtliche Werke: Nach den Texten der Gedenkausgabe des Artemis-Verlages, edited by Peter Boerner, 45 Volumes (München: Deutscher Taschenbuch Verlag, 1961-63).
  • Frankfurter Ausgabe: Sämtliche Werke. Briefe, Tagebücher und Gespräche, edited by Dieter Borchmeyer et al., 40 volumes in 2 divisions (Frankfurt a. M.: Deutscher Klassiker Verlag, 1985ff.).
  • Hamburger Ausgabe: Werke Hamburger Ausgabe in 14 Bänden, edited by Erich Trunz (Hamburg: Chr. Wegner, 1948-60; Reprinted, C. H. Beck, 1981).
  • Maximen und Reflexionen, edited by Max Hecker (Weimar: Schriften der Goethe Gesellschaft, 1907).
  • Münchner Ausgabe: Sämtliche Werke nach Epochen seines Schaffens, edited by Karl Richter et al., 20 volumes (München: C. Hanser, 1985-1998).
  • Weimarer Ausgabe (Sophienausgabe): Goethes Werke, edited under the sponsorship of Großherzogin Sophie von Sachsen, 143 Volumes in 4 divisions (Weimar: H. Böhlau, 1887-1919; Reprinted München: Deutscher Taschenbuch Verlag, 1987).
  • ii. Letters and Conversations

ii. Letters and Conversations

  • Eckermann, J.P., Gespräche mit Goethe in den letzten Jahren seines Lebens: 1823-1832, 3 Volumes (Leipzig: Geiger, 1836-1848).
  • Goethes Briefe: Hamburger Ausgabe, edited by Karl Robert Mandelkow, 4 Volumes (Hamburg, 1962-67 [Post-1972 Publication Site: München: Beck, 1972ff.).
  • Goethe: Begegnungen und Gespräche, edited by Ernst und Renate Grumach, 14 Volumes (Berlin: De Gruyter, 1965-2011).

iii. English Translations of Goethe’s Works

  • Conversations of Goethe with Johann Peter Eckermann, translated by John Oxenford (London: J.M. Dent & Sons, 1930).
  • Theory of Colors, translated by C.L. Eastlake (Boston: MIT Press, 1970).
  • Truth and Fiction Relating to my Life, translated by John Oxenford (Boston: Simonds & Co., 1902).

b. Selected Secondary Scholarship

i. Historical and Philosophical Context

  • Bates, A. (ed.), The Drama: Its History, Literature and Influence on Civilization, 20 vols. (London: Historical Publishing Company, 1906).
  • Borchmeyer, D., Goethe: Der Zeitbürger (München/Wien: Hanser, 1999).
  • Boyle, N., Goethe: The Poet and the Age (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991).
  • Breithaupt, F., Jenseits der Bilder: Goethes Politik der Wahrnehmung (Freiburg im Breisgau: Rombach, 2000).
  • Breithaupt, F., et al. (eds.), Goethe and Wittgenstein: Seeing the World’s Unity in its Variety (Frankfurt a.M.: Peter Lang, 2003).
  • Bruford, W.H., Culture and Society in Classical Weimar: 1775-1806 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1962).
  • Cassirer, E., Goethe und die geschichtliche Welt (Repr. Hamburg: Meiner, 1932).
  • Hildebrandt, G., Goethes Naturerkenntnis (Hamburg: Stromverlag, 1949).
  • Heller, E., The Disinherited Mind: Essays in Modern German Literature and Thought (Harmondsworth: Penguin Books, 1952).
  • Hinderer, W., Goethe und das Zeitalter der Romantik (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2002).
  • Hofman, P., Goethes Theologie (Paderborn: Schöningh, 2001).
  • Lauxtermann, P., Schopenhauer's Broken World-View: Colours and Ethics between Kant and Goethe (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2000).
  • Möckel, C., Anschaulichkeit des Wissens und kulturelle Sinnstiftung: Beiträge aus Lebensphilosophie, Phänomenologie und symbolischem Idealismus zu einer Goetheschen Fragestellung (Berlin: Logos, 2003).
  • Nicholls, A.J., Goethe's Concept of the Daemonic: After the Ancients (Rochester, NY: Camden House, 2006).
  • Reed, T.J., Goethe (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984).
  • Richards, R.J., The Romantic Conception of Life: Science and Philosophy in the Age of Goethe (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2002).
  • Schweitzer, A., Goethe: Four Studies, edited and translated by Charles R. Joy (Boston: Beacon Press, 1949).
  • Simmel, G., “Goethe und die Jugend,” in Der Tag 395 [6] (August, 1914), translated by Ulrich Teucher and Thomas M. Kemple in Theory, Culture, Society 24 (2007): 85-90.
  • Stephenson, R.H., Studies in Weimar Classicism: Writing as Symbolic Form (Oxford: Peter Lang, 2010).
  • Tantillo, A.O., The Will to Create: Goethe’s Philosophy of Nature (Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 2002).
  • Weier, W., Idee und Wirklichkeit: Philosophie deutscher Dichtung (Paderborn: Schöningh, 2005).

ii. Science and Methodology

  • Breidbach, O., Goethes Metamorphosenlehre (München: Fink, 2006).
  • Burwick, F., The Damnation of Newton: Goethe’s Color Theory and Romantic Perception (Berlin, Walter de Gruyter, 1986).
  • Ciamarra, L.P., Goethe e la storia: studi sulla "Geschichte der Farbenlehre" (Napoli: Liguori, 2001).
  • Holland, J., German Romanticism and Science: The Procreative Poetics of Goethe, Novalis, and Ritter (New York: Routledge, 2009).
  • Jardine, N., Scenes of Inquiry: On the Reality of Questions in the Sciences (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000).
  • Jürgen, T., Hoffnung und Gefahr (Frankfurt a.M.: Suhrkamp, 2001).
  • Krätz, O., Goethe und die Naturwissenschaften (München: Callwey, 1992).
  • Moiso, F., Goethe: La Natura e le sue Forme (Milano: Mimesis, 2002).
  • Nisbet, H.B., Goethe and the Scientific Tradition (London: Institute of Germanic Studies, 1972).
  • Nussbaumer, I., Zur Farbenlehre: Entdeckung der unordentlichen Spektren (Wien: Ed. Splitter, 2008).
  • Richards, R.J., The Tragic Sense of Life: Ernst Haeckel and the Struggle over Evolutionary Thought (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2008).
  • Seamon, D., & Zajonic, A., Goethe’s Way of Science (Albany: SUNY Press, 1998).
  • Sepper, D.L., Goethe contra Newton: Polemics and the Project for a New Science of Color (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
  • Sherrington, C., Goethe on Nature and Science (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1942).
  • Steigerwald, J., “Goethe’s Morphology: Ürphänomene and Aesthetic Appraisal,” Journal of the History of Biology 35 (2002): 291-328.
  • Stephenson, R.H., Goethe’s Conception of Knowledge and Science (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1995).
  • Wells, G.A., Goethe and the Development of Science: 1750-1900 (Alphen aan den Rijn: Sijthoff & Noordhoff, 1978).

iii. Aesthetics, Politics, and Theology

  • Bell, M., The German Tradition of Psychology in Literature and Thought, 1700-1840 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009).
  • Dönike, M., Pathos, Ausdruck und Bewegung: zur Ästhetik des Weimarer Klassizismus 1796 – 1806 (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2005).
  • Fröschle, H., Goethes Verhältnis zur Romantik (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 2002).
  • Hibbitt, R., Dilettantism and its Values: from Weimar Classicism to the fin de siècle
  • (London: Legenda, 2006).
  • Kuhn, B.H., Autobiography and Natural Science in the Age of Romanticism: Rousseau, Goethe, Thoreau (Farnham/Surrey: Ashgate, 2009).
  • Oergel, M., Culture and Identity: Historicity in German Literature and Thought 1770 – 1815 (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2006).


Author Information

Anthony K. Jensen
City University of New York / Lehman College
U. S. A.

Schopenhauer, Arthur

Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860)

Arthur Schopenhauer has been dubbed the artist’s philosopher on account of the inspiration his aesthetics has provided to artists of all stripes. He is also known as the philosopher of pessimism, as he articulated a worldview that challenges the value of existence. His elegant and muscular prose earn him a reputation as one the greatest German stylists. Although he never achieved the fame of such post-Kantian philosophers as Johann Gottlieb Fichte and G.W.F. Hegel in his lifetime, his thought informed the work of such luminaries as Sigmund Freud, Ludwig Wittgenstein and, most famously, Friedrich Nietzsche. He is also known as the first German philosopher to incorporate Eastern thought into his writings.

Schopenhauer’s thought is iconoclastic for a number of reasons. Although he considered himself Kant’s only true philosophical heir, he argued that the world was essentially irrational. Writing in the era of German Romanticism, he developed an aesthetics that was classicist in its emphasis on the eternal. When German philosophers were entrenched in the universities and immersed in the theological concerns of the time, Schopenhauer was an atheist who stayed outside the academic profession.

Schopenhauer’s lack of recognition during most of his lifetime may have been due to the iconoclasm of his thought, but it was probably also partly due to his irascible and stubborn temperament. The diatribes against Hegel and Fichte peppered throughout his works provide evidence of his state of mind. Regardless of the reason Schopenhauer’s philosophy was overlooked for so long, he fully deserves the prestige he enjoyed altogether too late in his life.

Table of Contents

  1. Schopenhauer’s Life
  2. Schopenhauer’s Thought
    1. The World as Will and Representation
      1. Schopenhauer’s Metaphysics and Epistemology
      2. The Ideas and Schopenhauer’s Aesthetics
    2. The Human Will
      1. Agency and Freedom
      2. Ethics
  3. Schopenhauer’s Pessimism
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources Available in English
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Schopenhauer’s Life

Arthur Schopenhauer was born on February 22, 1788 in Danzig (now Gdansk, Poland) to a prosperous merchant, Heinrich Floris Schopenhauer, and his much younger wife, Johanna. The family moved to Hamburg when Schopenhauer was five, because his father, a proponent of enlightenment and republican ideals, found Danzig unsuitable after the Prussian annexation. His father wanted Arthur to become a cosmopolitan merchant like himself and hence traveled with Arthur extensively in his youth. His father also arranged for Arthur to live with a French family for two years when he was nine, which allowed Arthur to become fluent in French. From an early age, Arthur wanted to pursue the life of a scholar. Rather than force him into his own career, Heinrich offered a proposition to Arthur: the boy could either accompany his parents on a tour of Europe, after which time he would apprentice with a merchant, or he could attend a gymnasium in preparation for attending university. Arthur chose the former option, and his witnessing firsthand on this trip the profound suffering of the poor helped shape his pessimistic philosophical worldview.

After returning from his travels, Arthur began apprenticing with a merchant in preparation for his career. When Arthur was 17 years old, his father died, most likely as a result of suicide. Upon his death, Arthur, his sister Adele, and his mother were each left a sizable inheritance. Two years following his father’s death, with the encouragement of his mother, Schopenhauer freed himself of his obligation to honor the wishes of his father, and he began attending a gymnasium in Gotha. He was an extraordinary pupil: he mastered Greek and Latin while there, but was dismissed from the school for lampooning a teacher.

In the meantime his mother, who was by all accounts not happy in the marriage, used her newfound freedom to move to Weimar and become engaged in the social and intellectual life of the city. She met with great success there, both as a writer and as a hostess, and her salon became the center of the intellectual life of the city with such luminaries as Johann Wolfgang von Goethe, the Schlegel brothers (Karl Wilhelm Friedrich and August Wilhelm), and Christoph Martin Wieland regularly in attendance. Johanna’s success had a bearing on Arthur’s future, for she introduced him to Goethe, which eventually led to their collaboration on a theory of colors. At one of his mother’s gatherings, Schopenhauer also met the Orientalist scholar Friedrich Majer, who stimulated in Arthur a lifelong interest in Eastern thought. At the same time, Johanna and Arthur never got along well: she found him morose and overly critical and he regarded her as a superficial social climber. The tensions between them reached its peak when Arthur was 30 years old, at which time she requested that he never contact her again.

Before his break with his mother, Arthur matriculated to the University of Göttingen in 1809, where he enrolled in the study of medicine. In his third semester at Göttingen, Arthur decided to dedicate himself to the study of philosophy, for in his words: “Life is an unpleasant business… I have resolved to spend mine reflecting on it.” Schopenhauer studied philosophy under the tutelage of Gottlieb Ernst Schultz, whose major work was a critical commentary of Kant’s system of transcendental idealism. Schultz insisted that Schopenhauer begin his study of philosophy by reading the works of Immanuel Kant and Plato, the two thinkers who became the most influential philosophers in the development of his own mature thought. Schopenhauer also began a study of the works of Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling, of whose thought he became deeply critical.

Schopenhauer transferred to Berlin University in 1811 for the purpose of attending the lectures of Johann Gottlieb Fichte, who at the time was considered the most exciting and important German philosopher of his day. Schopenhauer also attended Friedrich Schleiermacher’s lectures, for Schleiermacher was regarded as a highly competent translator and commentator of Plato. Schopenhauer became disillusioned with both thinkers, and with university intellectual life in general, which he regarded as unnecessarily abstruse, removed from genuine philosophical concerns, and compromised by theological agendas.

Napoleon’s Grande Armee arrived in Berlin in 1813, and soon after Schopenhauer moved to Rudolstat, a small town near Weimar, in order to escape the political turmoil. There Schopenhauer wrote his doctoral dissertation, The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, in which he provided a systematic investigation of the principle of sufficient reason. He regarded his project as a response to Kant who, in delineating the categories, neglected to attend to the forms that ground them. The following year Schopenhauer settled in Dresden, hoping that the quiet bucolic surroundings and rich intellectual resources found there would foster the development of his philosophical system. Schopenhauer also began an intense study of Baruch Spinoza, whose notion of natura naturans, a notion that characterized nature as self-activity, became key to the formulation of his account of the will in his mature system.

During his time in Dresden, he wrote On Vision and Colors, the product of his collaboration with Goethe. In this work, he used Goethe’s theory as a starting point in order to provide a theory superior to that of his mentor. Schopenhauer’s relationship with Goethe became strained after Goethe became aware of the publication. During his time in Dresden, Schopenhauer dedicated himself to completing his philosophical system, a system that combined Kant’s transcendental idealism with Schopenhauer’s original insight that the will is the thing-in-itself. He published his major work that expounded this system, The World as Will and Representation, in December of 1818 (with a publication date of 1819). To Schopenhauer’s chagrin, the book made no impression on the public.

In 1820, Schopenhauer was awarded permission to lecture at the University of Berlin. He deliberately, and impudently, scheduled his lectures during the same hour as those of G.W.F. Hegel, who was the most distinguished member of the faculty. Only a handful of students attended Schopenhauer’s lectures while over 200 students attended the lectures of Hegel. Although he remained on the list of lecturers for many years in Berlin, no one showed any further interest in attending his lectures, which only fueled his contempt for academic philosophy.

The following decade was perhaps Schopenhauer’s darkest and least productive. Not only did he suffer from the lack of recognition that his groundbreaking philosophy received, but he also suffered from a variety illnesses. He attempted to make a career as a translator from French and English prose, but these attempts also met with little interest from the outside world. During this time Schopenhauer also lost a lawsuit to the seamstress Caroline Luise Marguet that began in 1821 and was settled five years later. Marguet accused Schopenhauer of beating and kicking her when she refused to leave the antechamber to his apartment. As a result of the suit, Schopenhauer had to pay her 60 thalers annually for the rest of her life.

In 1831, Schopenhauer fled Berlin because of a cholera epidemic (an epidemic that later took the life of Hegel) and settled in Frankfurt am Main, where he remained for the rest of his life. In Frankfurt, he again became productive, publishing a number of works that expounded various points in his philosophical system. He published On the Will in Nature in 1836, which explained how new developments in the physical sciences served as confirmation of his theory of the will. In 1839, he received public recognition for the first time, a prize awarded by the Norwegian Academy, on his essay, On the Freedom of the Human Will. In 1840 he submitted an essay entitled On the Basis of Morality to the Danish Academy, but was awarded no prize even though his essay was the only submission. In 1841, he published both essays under the title, The Fundamental Problems of Morality, and included an introduction that was little more than a scathing indictment of Danish Academy for failing to recognize the value of his insights.

Schopenhauer was able to publish an enlarged second edition to his major work in 1843, which more than doubled the size of the original edition. The new expanded edition earned Schopenhauer no more acclaim than the original work. He published a work of popular philosophical essays and aphorisms aimed at the general public in 1851 under the title, Parerga and Paralipomena (Secondary Works and Belated Observations). This work, the most unlikely of his books, earned him his fame, and from the most unlikely of places: a review written by the English scholar John Oxenford, entitled “Iconoclasm in German Philosophy,” which was translated into German. The review excited an interest in German readers, and Schopenhauer became famous virtually overnight. Schopenhauer spent the rest of his life reveling in his hard won and belated fame, and died in 1860.

2. Schopenhauer’s Thought

Schopenhauer’s philosophy stands apart from other German idealist philosophers in many respects. Perhaps most surprising for the first time reader of Schopenhauer familiar with the writings of other German idealists would be the clarity and elegance of his prose. Schopenhauer was an avid reader of the great stylists in England and France, and he tried to emulate their style in his own writings. Schopenhauer often charged more abstruse writers such as Fichte and Hegel with deliberate obfuscation, describing the latter as a scribbler of nonsense in his second edition of The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason.

Schopenhauer’s philosophy also stands in contrast with his contemporaries insofar as his system remains virtually unchanged from its first articulation in the first edition of The World as Will and Representation. Even his dissertation, which he wrote before he recognized the role of the will in metaphysics, was incorporated into his mature system. For this reason, his thought has been arranged thematically rather than chronologically below.

a. The World as Will and Representation

i. Schopenhauer’s Metaphysics and Epistemology

The starting point for Schopenhauer’s metaphysics is Immanuel Kant’s system of transcendental idealism as explained in The Critique of Pure Reason. Although Schopenhauer is quite critical of much of the content of Kant’s Transcendental Analytic, he endorses Kant’s approach to metaphysics in Kant’s limiting the sphere of metaphysics to articulating the conditions of experience rather than transcending the bounds of experience. In addition, he accepts the results of the Transcendental Aesthetic, which demonstrate the truth of transcendental idealism. Like Kant, Schopenhauer argues that the phenomenal world is a representation, i.e., an object for the subject conditioned by the forms of our cognition. At the same time, Schopenhauer simplifies the activity of the Kantian cognitive apparatus by holding that all cognitive activity occurs according to the principle of sufficient reason, that is, that nothing is without a reason for being.

In Schopenhauer’s dissertation, which was published under the title The Fourfold Root of Sufficient Reason, he argues that all of our representations are connected according to one of the four manifestations of the principle of sufficient reason, each of which concerns a different class of objects. The principle of sufficient reason of becoming, which regards empirical objects, provides an explanation in terms of causal necessity: any material state presupposes a prior state from which it regularly follows. The principle of sufficient reason of knowing, which regards concepts or judgments, provides an explanation in terms of logical necessity: if a judgment is to be true, it must have a sufficient ground. Regarding the third branch of the principle, that of space and time, the ground for being is mathematical: space and time are so constituted that all their parts mutually determine one another. Finally, for the principle regarding willing, we require as a ground a motive, which is an inner cause for that which it was done. Every action presupposes a motive from which it follows by necessity.

Schopenhauer argues that prior philosophers, including Kant, have failed to recognize that the first manifestation and second manifestations are distinct, and subsequently tend to conflate logical grounds and causes. Moreover, philosophers have not heretofore recognized the principle’s operation in the realms of mathematics and human action. Thus Schopenhauer was confident that his dissertation not only would provide an invaluable corrective to prior accounts of the principle of sufficient reason, but would also allow every brand of explanation to acquire greater certainty and precision.

It should be noted that while Schopenhauer’s account of the principle of sufficient reason owes much to Kant’s account of the faculties, his account is significantly at odds with Kant’s in several ways. For Kant, the understanding always operates by means of concepts and judgments, and the faculties of understanding and reason are distinctly human (at least regarding those animate creatures with which we are familiar). Schopenhauer, however, asserts that the understanding is not conceptual and is a faculty that both animals and humans possess. In addition, Schopenhauer’s account of the fourth root of the principle of sufficient reason is at odds with Kant’s account of human freedom, for Schopenhauer argues that actions follow necessarily from their motives.

Schopenhauer incorporates his account of the principle of sufficient reason into the metaphysical system of his chief work, The World as Will and Representation. As we have seen, Schopenhauer, like Kant, holds that representations are always constituted by the forms of our cognition. However, Schopenhauer points out that there is an inner nature to phenomena that eludes the principle of sufficient reason. For example, etiology (the science of physical causes) describes the manner in which causality operates according to the principle of sufficient reason, but it cannot explain the natural forces that underlie and determine physical causality. All such forces remain, to use Schopenhauer’s term, “occult qualities.”

At the same time, there is one aspect of the world that is not given to us merely as representation, and that is our own bodies. We are aware of our bodies as objects in space and time, as a representation among other representations, but we also experience our bodies in quite a different way, as the felt experiences of our own intentional bodily motions (that is, kinesthesis). This felt awareness is distinct from the body’s spatio-temporal representation. Since we have insight into what we ourselves are aside from representation, we can extend this insight to every other representation as well. Thus, Schopenhauer concludes, the innermost nature [Innerste], the underlying force, of every representation and also of the world as a whole is the will, and every representation is an objectification of the will. In short, the will is the thing in itself. Thus Schopenhauer can assert that he has completed Kant’s project because he has successfully identified the thing in itself.

Although every representation is an expression of will, Schopenhauer denies that every item in the world acts intentionally or has consciousness of its own movements. The will is a blind, unconscious force that is present in all of nature. Only in its highest objectifications, that is, only in animals, does this blind force become conscious of its own activity. Although the conscious purposive striving that the term ‘will’ implies is not a fundamental feature of the will, conscious purposive striving is the manner in which we experience it and Schopenhauer chooses the term with this fact in mind.

Hence, the title of Schopenhauer’s major work, The World as Will and Representation, aptly summarizes his metaphysical system. The world is the world of representation, as a spatio-temporal universal of individuated objects, a world constituted by our own cognitive apparatus. At the same time, the inner being of this world, what is outside of our cognitive apparatus or what Kant calls the thing-in-itself, is the will; the original force manifested in every representation.

ii. The Ideas and Schopenhauer’s Aesthetics

Schopenhauer argues that space and time, which are the principles of individuation, are foreign to the thing-in-itself, for they are the modes of our cognition. For us, the will expresses itself in a variety of individuated beings, but the will in itself is an undivided unity. It is the same force at work in our own willing, in the movements of animals, of plants and of inorganic bodies.

Yet, if the world is composed of undifferentiated willing, why does this force manifest itself in such a vast variety of ways? Schopenhauer’s reply is that the will is objectified in a hierarchy of beings. At its lowest grade, we see the will objectified in natural forces, and at its highest grade the will is objectified in the species of human being. The phenomena of higher grades of the will are produced by conflicts occurring between different phenomena of the lower grades of the will, and in the phenomenon of the higher Idea, the lower grades are subsumed. For instance, the laws of chemistry and gravity continue to operate in animals, although such lower grades cannot explain fully their movements. Although Schopenhauer explains the grades of the will in terms of development, he insists that the gradations did not develop over time, for such an understanding would assume that time exists independently of our cognitive faculties. Thus in all natural beings we see the will expressing itself in its various objectifications. Schopenhauer identifies these objectifications with the Platonic Ideas for a number of reasons. They are outside of space and time, related to individual beings as their prototypes, and ontologically prior to the individual beings that correspond to them.

Although the laws of nature presuppose the Ideas, we cannot intuit the Ideas simply by observing the activities of nature, and this is due to the relation of the will to our representations. The will is the thing in itself, but our experience of the will, our representations, are constituted by our form of cognition, the principle of sufficient reason. The principle of sufficient reason produces the world of representation as a nexus of spatio-temporal, causally related entities. Therefore, Schopenhauer’s metaphysical system seems to preclude our having access to the Ideas as they are in themselves, or in a way that transcends this spatio-temporal causally related framework.

However, Schopenhauer asserts that there is a kind of knowing that is free from the principle of sufficient reason. To have knowledge that is not conditioned by our forms of cognition would be an impossibility for Kant. Schopenhauer makes such knowledge possible by distinguishing the conditions of knowing, namely, the principle of sufficient reason, from the condition for objectivity in general. To be an object for a subject is a condition of objects that is more basic than the principle of sufficient reason for Schopenhauer. Since the principle of sufficient reason allows us to experience objects as particulars existing in space and time with a causal relation to other things, to have an experience of an object solely insofar as it presents itself to a subject, apart from the principle of sufficient reason, is to experience an object that is neither spatio-temporal nor in a causal relation to other objects. Such objects are the Ideas, and the kind of cognition involved in perceiving them is aesthetic contemplation, for perception of the Ideas is the experience of the beautiful.

Schopenhauer argues that the ability to transcend the everyday point of view and regard objects of nature aesthetically is not available to most human beings. Rather, the ability to regard nature aesthetically is the hallmark of the genius, and Schopenhauer describes the content of art through an examination of genius. The genius, claims Schopenhauer, is one who has been given by nature a superfluity of intellect over will. For Schopenhauer, the intellect is designed to serve the will. Since in living organisms, the will manifests itself as the drive for self-preservation, the intellect serves individual organisms by regulating their relations with the external world in order to secure their self-preservation. Because the intellect is designed to be entirely in service of the will, it slumbers, to use Schopenhauer’s colorful metaphor, unless the will awakens it and sets it in motion. Therefore ordinary knowledge always concerns the relations, laid down by the principle of sufficient reason, of objects in terms of the demands of the will.

Although the intellect exists only to serve the will, in certain humans the intellect accorded by nature is so disproportionately large, it far exceeds the amount needed to serve the will. In such individuals, the intellect can break free of the will and act independently. A person with such an intellect is a genius (only men can have such a capability according to Schopenhauer), and this will-free activity is aesthetic contemplation or creation. The genius is thus distinguished by his ability to engage in will-less contemplation of the Ideas for a sustained period of time, which allows him to repeat what he has apprehended by creating a work of art. In producing a work of art, the genius makes the beautiful accessible for the non-genius as well. Whereas non-geniuses cannot intuit the Ideas in nature, they can intuit them in a work of art, for the artist replicates nature in the artwork in such a manner that the viewer is capable of viewing it disinterestedly, that is, freed from her own willing, as an Idea.

Schopenhauer states that aesthetic contemplation is characterized by objectivity. The intellect in its normal functioning is in the service of the will. As such, our normal perception is always tainted by our subjective strivings. The aesthetic point of view, since it is freed from such strivings, is more objective than any other ways of regarding an object. Art does not transport the viewer to an imaginary or even ideal realm. Rather it affords the opportunity to view life without the distorting influence of his own will.

b. The Human Will: Agency, Freedom, and Ethical Action

i. Agency and Freedom

Any account of human agency in Schopenhauer must be given in terms of his account of the will. For Schopenhauer, all acts of will are bodily movements, and thus are not the internal cause of bodily movements. What distinguishes an act of will from other events, which are also expressions of the will, is that it meets two criteria: it is a bodily movement caused by a motive, and it is accompanied by a direct awareness of this movement. Schopenhauer provides both a psychological and physiological account of motives. In his psychological account, motives are causes that occur in the medium of cognition, or internal causes. Motives are mental events that arise in response to an awareness of some motivating object. Schopenhauer argues that these mental events can never be desires or emotions: desires and emotions are expressions of the will and thus are not included under the class of representations. Rather, a motive is the awareness of some object of representation. These representations can be abstract; thinking the concept of an object, or intuitive; perceiving an object. Thus Schopenhauer provides a causal picture of action, and it is one in which mental events cause physical events.

In Schopenhauer’s physiological account of motives, motives are brain processes that cause certain neural activities and these translate into bodily motion. The psychological and physical accounts are consistent insofar as Schopenhauer has a dual-aspect view of the mental and physical. The mental and the physical are not two causally linked realms, but two aspects of the same nature, where one cannot be reduced to or explained by the other. It is important to underscore the fact that in the physiological account, the will is not a function of the brain. Rather it is present as irritability in the muscular fibers of the whole body.

According to Schopenhauer, the will, as muscular irritability, is a continual striving for activity in general. Because this striving has no direction, it aims at all directions at once and thus produces no physical movement. However, when the nervous system provides the direction for this movement (that is, when motives act on the will), the movement is given direction and bodily movement occurs. The nerves do not move the muscles, rather they provide the occasion for the muscles’ movements.

The causal mechanism in acts of will is necessary and lawful, as are all causal relations in Schopenhauer’s view. Acts of will follow from motives with the same necessity that the motion of a billiard ball follows from its being struck. Yet this account leads to a problem concerning the unpredictability of acts: if the causal process is law governed, and if acts of will are causally determined, Schopenhauer must account for the fact that human actions are unpredictable. This unpredictability of human action, he argues, is due to the impossibility of knowing comprehensively the character of an individual. Each character is unique, and thus it is impossible to predict fully how a motive or set of motives will effect bodily motion. In addition, we usually do not know what a person’s beliefs are concerning the motive, and these beliefs influence how she will respond to it. However, if we had a full account of a person’s character as well as her beliefs, we could with scientific accuracy predict what bodily motion would result from a particular motive.

Schopenhauer distinguishes between causation that occurs through stimuli, which is mechanistic, and that which occurs through motives. Each kind of causality occurs with necessity and lawfulness. The difference between these different classifications of causes regards the commensurability and proximity of cause and the effect, not their degree of lawfulness. In mechanical causation, the cause is contiguous and commensurate to the effect, both cause and effect are easily perceived, and therefore their causal lawfulness is clear. For instance, a billiard ball must be struck in order to move, and the force in which one ball hits will be equal to the force in which the other ball moves. In stimuli, causes are proximate: there is no separation between receiving the impression and being determined by it. At the same time, cause and effect are not always commensurate: for instance, when a plant reaches up to the sun, the sun as cause makes no motion to produce the effect of the plant’s movement. In motive causality, the cause is neither proximate nor commensurate: the memory of Helen can cause whole armies to run to battle, for instance. Consequently the lawfulness in motive causality is difficult, if not impossible, to perceive.

Because human action is causally determined, Schopenhauer denies that humans can freely choose how they respond to motives. In any course of events, one and only one course of action is available to the agent, and the agent performs that action with necessity. Schopenhauer must, then, account for the fact that agents experience their own actions as contingent. Moreover, he must account for the active nature of agency, the fact that agents experience their actions as things they do and not things that happen to them.

Schopenhauer gives an explanation of the active nature of agency, but not in terms of the causal efficacy of agents. Instead, the key to accounting for human agency lies in the distinction between one’s intelligible and empirical character. Our intelligible character is our character outside of space and time, and is the original force of the will. We cannot have access to our intelligible character, as it exists outside our forms of knowing. Like all forces in nature, it is original, inalterable and inexplicable. Our empirical character is our character insofar as it manifests itself in individual acts of will: it is, in short, the phenomenon of the intelligible character. The empirical character is an object of experience and thus tied to the forms of experience, namely space, time and causality.

However, the intelligible character is not determined by these forms, and thus is free. Schopenhauer calls this freedom transcendental, as it is outside the realm of experience. Although we can have no experience of our intelligible character, we do have some awareness of the fact that our actions issue from it and thus are very much our own. This awareness accounts for our experiencing our deeds as both original and spontaneous. Thus our deeds are both events linked with other events in a lawfully determined causal chain and acts that issue directly from our own characters. Our actions can embody both these otherwise contradictory characterizations because these characterizations refer to the deeds from two different aspects of our characters, the empirical and the intelligible.

Our characters also explain why we attribute moral responsibility to agents even though acts are causally necessitated. Characters determine the consequences that motives effect on our bodies. Yet, states Schopenhauer, our characters are entirely our own: our characters are fundamentally what we are. This is why we assign praise or blame not to acts but to the agents who commit them. And this is why we hold ourselves responsible: not because we could have acted differently given who we are, but that we could have been different from who we are. Although there is not freedom in our action, there is freedom in our essence, our intelligible character, insofar as our essence lies outside the forms of our cognition, that is to say, space, time and causality.

ii. Ethics

Like Kant, Schopenhauer reconciles freedom and necessity in human action through the distinction between the phenomenal and noumenal realms. However, he was sharply critical of Kant’s deontological framework. Schopenhauer charged Kant with committing a petitio principii, for he assumed at the outset of his ethics that purely moral laws and then constructed an ethics to account for such laws. Schopenhauer argues, however, that Kant provides no proof for the existence of such laws. Indeed, Schopenhauer avers that no such laws, which have their basis in theological assumptions, exist. Likewise, Schopenhauer attacks Kant’s account of morality as characterized by an unconditioned ought. The notion of ‘ought’ only carries motivational force when accompanied by the threat of sanctions. Because no ought can be unconditioned insofar as its motivational force stems from its implicit threat of punishment, all imperatives are in fact, according to Schopenhauer, hypothetical.

Nor does Schopenhauer accept Kant’s claim that morality derives from reason: like David Hume, Schopenhauer regards reason as instrumental. The origins of morality are not found in reason, but rather in the feeling of compassion that allows one to transcend the standpoint of egoism. The dictum of morality is “Harm no one and help others as much as you can.” Most persons operate exclusively from egoistic motives, for, as Schopenhauer explains, our knowledge of our own weal and woe is direct, while our knowledge of the weal and woe of others is always only representation and thus does not affect us.

Although most persons are motivated primarily by egoistic concerns, certain rare persons can act from compassion, and it is compassion that forms the basis of Schopenhauer’s ethics. Compassion is prompted by the awareness of the suffering of another person, and Schopenhauer characterizes it as a kind of felt knowledge. Compassion is born of the awareness that individuation is merely phenomenal. Consequently the ethical point of view expresses a deeper knowledge than what is found in the ordinary manner of viewing the world. Indeed, the feeling of compassion is nothing other than the felt knowledge that the suffering of another has a reality equal to one’s own suffering insofar as the world in itself is an undifferentiated unity. Schopenhauer asserts that this knowledge cannot be taught or even communicated, but can only be brought about by experience.

Since compassion is the basis of Schopenhauer’s ethics, the ethical significance of conduct is found in the motive alone, an aspect of his ethics that finds affinity with Kant. Thus Schopenhauer distinguishes the just person from the good person not by the nature of their actions, but by their level of compassion: the just person sees through the principle of individuation enough to avoid causing harm to another, whereas the good person sees through it even further, to the point that the suffering he sees in others touches him almost as closely as does his own. Such a person not only avoids harming others, but actively tries to alleviate the suffering of others. At its highest point, someone may recognize the suffering of others with such clarity that he is willing to sacrifice his own well-being for the sake of others, if by doing so the suffering he will alleviate outweighs the suffering he must endure. This, says Schopenhauer, is the highest point in ethical conduct.

3. Schopenhauer’s Pessimism

Schopenhauer’s pessimism is the most well known feature of his philosophy, and he is often referred to as the philosopher of pessimism. Schopenhauer’s pessimistic vision follows from his account of the inner nature of the world as aimless blind striving.

Because the will has no goal or purpose, the will’s satisfaction is impossible. The will objectifies itself in a hierarchy of gradations from inorganic to organic life, and every grade of objectification of the will, from gravity to animal motion, is marked by insatiable striving. In addition, every force of nature and every organic form of nature participates in a struggle to seize matter from other forces or organisms. Thus existence is marked by conflict, struggle and dissatisfaction.

The attainment of a goal or desire, Schopenhauer continues, results in satisfaction, whereas the frustration of such attainment results in suffering. Since existence is marked by want or deficiency, and since satisfaction of this want is unsustainable, existence is characterized by suffering. This conclusion holds for all of nature, including inanimate natures, insofar as they are at essence will. However, suffering is more conspicuous in the life of human beings because of their intellectual capacities. Rather than serving as a relief from suffering, the intellect of human beings brings home their suffering with greater clarity and consciousness. Even with the use of reason, human beings can in no way alter the degree of misery we experience; indeed, reason only magnifies the degree to which we suffer. Thus all the ordinary pursuits of mankind are not only fruitless but also illusory insofar as they are oriented toward satisfying an insatiable, blind will.

Since the essence of existence is insatiable striving, and insatiable striving is suffering, Schopenhauer concludes that nonexistence is preferable to existence. However, suicide is not the answer. One cannot resolve the problem of existence through suicide, for since all existence is suffering, death does not end one’s suffering but only terminates the form that one’s suffering takes. The proper response to recognizing that all existence is suffering is to turn away from or renounce one’s own desiring. In this respect, Schopenhauer’s thought finds confirmation in the Eastern texts he read and admired: the goal of human life is to turn away from desire. Salvation can only be found in resignation.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources Available in English

  • Manuscript Remains in Four Volumes. Edited by Arthur Hübscher, Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Oxford: Berg Publishers, 1988.
  • On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. LaSalle: Open Court Press, 1997.
  • On the Basis of Morality. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Indianapolis: The Bobbs Merrill Company, 1965.
  • On the Will in Nature. Translated by E.F.J. Payne, Edited by David Cartwright. New York: Berg Publishers, 1992.
  • Parerga and Paralipomena Volumes 1 and II. Translated by E.F.J. Payne. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Prize Essay on the Freedom of the Will. Edited by Gunther Zoller, Translated by E.F. J. Payne. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • The World as Will and Representation. Translated by E.F.J. Payne, 2 vols. New York: Dover, 1969.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Atwell, John E. Schopenhauer: The Human Character . Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990.
    • Provides a lucid account of Schopenhauer’s ethics and pessimism.
  • Atwell, John E. Schopenhauer on the Character of the World: The Metaphysics of Will. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1995.
    • An excellent and comprehensive account of Schopenhauer’s metaphysics and epistemology that brings new insight into Schopenhauer’s methodology.
  • Cartwright, David E. Schopenhauer: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • The most comprehensive biography of Schopenhauer available in English.
  • Copleston, Frederick. Arthur Schopenhauer, Philosopher of Pessimism. London: Barnes and Noble, 1975.
    • The first book length monograph on Schopenhauer written in English.
  • Hamlyn, D.W. Schopenhauer. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
    • A brief but substantive critical analysis of his thought that includes a strong summary of his dissertation as well as his relationship to Kant.
  • Hübscher, Arthur, The Philosophy of Schopenhauer in Its Intellectual Context: Thinker Against the Tide. Translated by Joachim T. Baer and David E. Cartwright. Lewiston, N.Y : Edwin Mellon Press, 1989.
    • An excellent intellectual biography, extensively covers his earliest (pre-dissertation) thought and the influences of German romanticism and idealism.
  • Jacquette, Dale, ed. Schopenhauer, Philosophy, and the Arts. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
    • A collection of essays on both Schopenhauer’s aesthetics and the influence his aesthetics had on later artists.
  • Janaway, Christopher, ed. Willing and Nothingness: Schopenhauer as Nietzsche’s Educator. Oxford; Clarendon Press, 1998.
    • These essays explore Schopenhauer’s influence on Nietzsche. The book includes a complete list of textual references to Schopenhauer in Nietzsche’s writings.
  • Magee, Bryan. The Philosophy of Schopenhauer. Oxford: Carendon Press, 1983.
    • Covers the whole of Schopenhauer’s thought, as well as an extensive account on his influence on later thinkers and artists such as Wagner and Wittgenstein.
  • Safranski, Ruediger, Schopenhauer and the Wild Years of Philosophy. Translated by Ewald Osers, London: Weidenfeld and Nicolson, 1989.
    • An entertaining biography that provides insight into the political and cultural milieu in which Schopenhauer developed his thought.
  • Young, Julian, Willing and Unwilling: A Study in the Philosophy of Arthur Schopenhauer. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff, 1987.
    • An influential reading of Schopenhauer’s work, which argues that Schopenhauer’s account of the thing-in-itself cannot be wholly identified with the will.

Author Information

Mary Troxell
Boston College
U. S. A.

Schelling, F. W. J. von

Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775-1854)

Schelling F. W. J. von Schelling is one of the great German philosophers of the late 18th and early 19th Century. Some historians and scholars of philosophy have classified him as a German Idealist, along with J. G. Fichte and G. W. F. Hegel. Such classifications obscure rather than illuminate the importance and singularity of Schelling’s place in the history of philosophy. This is because the dominant and most often limited understanding of Idealism as systematic metaphysics of the Subject is applicable more to Hegel’s philosophy than Schelling's. While initiating the Post-Kantian Idealism of the Subject, Schelling went on to exhibit in his later works the limit and dissolution of such a systemic metaphysics of the Subject. Therefore, the convenient label of Schelling as one German Idealist amongst others ignores the singularity of Schelling’s philosophy and the complex relationship he had with the movement of German Idealism.

The real importance of Schelling’s later works lies in the exposure of the dominant systemic metaphysics of the Subject to its limit rather than in its confirmation. In this way, the later works of Schelling demand from the students and philosophers of German Idealism a re-assessment of the notion of German Idealism itself. In that sense, the importance and influence of Schelling’s philosophy has remained “untimely.” In the wake of Hegelian rational philosophy that was the official philosophy of that time, Schelling’s later works was not influential and fell onto deaf ears. Only in the twentieth century when the question of the legitimacy of the philosophical project of modernity had come to be the concern for philosophers and thinkers, did Schelling’s radical opening of philosophy to “post-metaphysical” thinking receive renewed attention.

This is because it is perceived that the task of philosophical thinking is no longer the foundational act of the systematic metaphysics of the Subject. In the wake of “end of philosophy,” the philosophical task is understood to be the inauguration of new thinking beyond metaphysics. In this context, Schelling has again come into prominence as someone who in the heyday of German Idealism has opened up the possibility of a philosophical thinking beyond the closure of the metaphysics of the Subject. The importance of Schelling for such post-metaphysical thinking is rightly emphasized by Martin Heidegger in his lecture on Schelling of 1936. In this manner Heidegger prepares the possibility of understanding Schelling’s works in an entirely different manner. Heidegger’s reading of Schelling in turn has immensely influenced the Post-Heideggerian French philosophical turn to the question of “the exit from metaphysics”. But this Post-Structuralist and deconstructive reading of Schelling is not the only reception of Schelling. Philosophers like Jürgen Habermas, whose doctorate work was on Schelling, would like to insist on the continuation of the philosophical project of modernity, and yet attempt to view reason beyond the instrumental functionality of reason at the service of domination and coercion. Schelling is seen from this perspective as a “post-metaphysical” thinker who has widened the concept of reason beyond its self-grounding projection. During the last half of the last century, Schelling’s works have tremendously influenced the post-Subject oriented philosophical discourses. During recent times, Schelling scholarship has remarkably increased both in the Anglo-American context and the Continental philosophical context.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
    1. Naturphilosophie and Transcendental Philosophy
    2. Identity Philosophy
    3. The Middle period
    4. Positive Philosophy
  3. Influences
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling was born on 27 January, 1775 in Leonberg, Germany. His father was Joseph Friedrich Schelling and mother was Gottliebin Maria Cless. In 1785 Schelling attended the Latin School in Nürtingen. A precocious child, his teachers soon found nothing more to teach him. In 1790, Schelling joined the Tübingenstift, a Protestant Seminary, in Tübingen where he befriended Hölderlin who was later to become a great German poet, and Hegel who was to become a great philosopher. In 1794 Schelling published Über die Möglichkeit einer Form der Philosophie Überhaupt, in the same year of the publication of Fichte’s  Wissenshaftlehre. Fichte’s Wissenshaftlehre, along with Kant’s Critique of Judgment that was published four years before (1790), proved to be of decisive importance for Schelling’s early philosophical career. In 1798 at the age of just 23, Schelling was called to a professorship at the University of Jena where he came in contact with German Romantic poets and philosophers like the Schlegel brothers and Novalis. He also met August Wilhelm Schlegel’s wife Caroline Schlegel and there begun one of the most fascinating and scandalous romantic stories of that time, leading to Caroline’s divorce and her marriage to Schelling in 1803. In 1803 he left Jena for Würzburg where he was called to a professorship. In the Autumn of 1805 Würzburg fell to Austria. The following year Schelling left for Munich where he was to stay till 1841 apart from a break between 1820-1827 when he lived in Erlangen. In 1809 Schelling published his great treatise on human freedom, Philosophical Inquiries Concerning the Nature of Human Freedom. A few months later Caroline died.. Schelling was devastated. In 1812 Schelling married Pauline who was to remain his life long companion. In 1831 Hegel died. In 1840 Schelling was called upon to the now vacant chair in Berlin to replace Hegel where he sought to elaborate his Positivphilosophie which was attended by the likes of Søren Kierkegaard, Alexander Humboldt, Bakunin and Engels. In 1854 on 20 August Schelling died at the age of 79 in Bad Ragaz, Switzerland.

2. Philosophy

Encounter with the works of Schelling often baffles the scholars and historians of philosophy. Schelling’s works seem to exhibit the lack of consistent development or systematic completion which most of his contemporaries possess. As a result scholars and historians of philosophy complain of the absence of a “single” Schelling. Recent scholarship, however, while accepting the often disruptive and discontinuous movement with which Schelling’s thinking moves that defies and un-works the completion of a single definite philosophical system, finds issues that are singular to Schelling’s continuous attention and unceasing concern. Thus the absence of a systematic completion is what has become the source of fascination for recent Schelling scholarship. Schelling appears to be the mark that delineates the limit of the systematic task of philosophy, “the end of philosophy and the task of thinking” as Heidegger says. Prominent Schelling scholars like Manfred Frank and Andrew Bowie (1993) have, however, pointed out that Schelling had never abandoned the idea of ‘system’, although the idea of ‘system’ was no longer grounded on a restricted, narcissistic concept of reason as totalizing and self-grounding but as opening to that which cannot be thought in the concept.

For the sake of convenience we can roughly divide the philosophical career of Schelling into four stages:

a. Naturphilosophie and Transcendental Philosophy

b. Identity philosophy

c. The Middle period: Freedom essay and The Ages of the World

d. Positive Philosophy (Philosophy of Mythology and Philosophy of Revelation)

a. Naturphilosophie and Transcendental Philosophy

The significance of Schelling’s early philosophical works lies in its radically new understanding of nature that departs significantly from the then dominant philosophical and scientific understanding of nature. Perhaps the best the way to approach the Schelling of Naturphilosophie is to see him, on the one hand, in relation to the dominant mechanistic determination of nature at that time, that of the Newtonian mathematical determination of nature according to which nature follows certain determinable physical laws of motion and rest, and that can be grasped in the objective cognition that has universal and non-relative validity and on the other hand, as a development of post-Kantian philosophy that led to a radical revision of Kant himself. Schelling’s philosophy of nature thus arose out of the demand to respond to the mechanistic determination of nature that was dominant at that time on the one hand, and to respond to the problems that arose in Kant’s division of the phenomenal realm of nature and noumenal realm of freedom. This demanded a dynamic philosophical account of nature where nature is no longer seen as a totality of objects that are a mere inert, opaque mass, but nature that is subjected to universal laws of causality. Such a dynamic philosophy of nature must be able to resolve the abyss that is opened up in the wake of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. It is the abyss between the deterministic, causal, conditioned realm of understanding on the one hand, and the unconditioned realm of ethical self-determination on the other hand, between theoretical philosophy and practical philosophy. The task that the Post-Kantian philosophy has given to itself is to bridge this gap between the conceptual, constitutive realm of nature which can be grasped by causal laws that has universal validity, and the ethical spontaneity of the practical reason where the ethical subject is beyond the conditioned realm of determination and is thus a free Subject of self-determination. This Subject is the Subject of freedom that cannot be grounded in the constitutive principles of understanding but in the regulative Ideas of reason. J. G Fichte sought to unify the theoretical reason (that is “understanding”) and the practical reason by  grounding them both in the dynamic activity of the self-consciousness that posits itself as pure, unconditioned act of self-positing ‘I’. The task of accounting for the process of emergence of the world of nature, which is thus a dynamic process, is addressed by Fichte thus: nature is an essential self-limitation of the ‘I’. The unconditioned, infinite self-positing ‘I’, in order to know itself as itself, divides itself into the finite ‘I’ and its counter-movement “Not-I”. In this manner, Fichte claimed to have resolved the problem that appeared to him and to the post-Kantian philosophers as that which is left unresolved by Kant himself. This is the question of how to account for the mysterious X, “the thing-in-itself” which, according to Kant, can never be grounded in the constitutive principle of understanding. As the condition of possibility of knowledge, “the thing-in-itself” can never be known. It is irreducible to the concepts of understanding. Fichte in his Science of Knowledge accounts for the genesis of this “thing-in-itself” in the pure self-positing act of the ‘I’. Since the ‘I’ cannot be an object of outer sense like any other objects of cognition ( Kant prohibits this), ‘I’ can only emerge in a pure, primordial act of inner-self. This self-emerging ‘I’ cannot therefore be an object of conceptual cognition, of an empirical intuition. It can only be grasped in the inner sense in ‘intellectual intuition’ which is none but ‘the fact of self-consciousness.’ According to Fichte, ‘the thing-in-itself’ is this self-emerging self-consciousness which is a ‘fact’ unlike any other ‘fact’. It is a fact that only ‘intellectual intuition’ grasps in the act of pure self-intuition. This is because only a being capable of intuiting itself as simultaneously representing and represented can account for the unity of representation and object. For such a being, that is ‘I’, there is no other predicate than itself. It is its own object. This object for it appears as nature which is the self-limitation of the self-positing Subject. Fichte’s idealism later came to be known as Subjective Idealism.

Schelling’s early works flourished under the influence of Fichte’s thinking. In 1797 Schelling published an essay called Treatise Explicatory of the Idealism in the “Science of Knowledge” in Philosophisches Journal edited by Immanuel Niethammer. This essay is crucial document for understanding the transition from Kantian critical philosophy to German Idealism. While attempting to elucidate what Kant would have intended if Kant’s philosophy is to prove internally cohesive, Schelling moves to the task of unifying theoretical and practical philosophy in a single principle in such a manner that he actually moves beyond both Kantian and Fichtean philosophy. What allows this unification of theoretical and practical philosophy is the Spirit’s infinite striving to represent the universe. The Spirit is not a static entity given, something mysterious X, but infinite becoming and infinite productivity. It is in this ceaseless production lies the organic nature of human Spirit that is moved by its immanent laws and that has its purposive-ness within itself. Schelling here introduces the notion of organism which unites in its immanence its goal and purpose, its form and matter, concept and intuition. As such each organism is a system which is “an arabesque delineation of the soul” or “eternal archetype” that finds expression in every plant. As immanent unity of form and matter that orients itself towards absolute purposive-ness through successive stages, this organism is not thus mere static, lifeless entity but is said to exhibit life. The Idealist notion of the system here takes this unified world of organism as model. Intuition is the unity of form and matter, representation and object which is distinguishable only in the concept that freely repeats the originary unity. With the help of the schematic power of the imagination, concept here produces the individual object of cognition. The succession of representation occurs alternately in a circle. To move beyond this circle of theoretical knowledge, this circle where the object always returns, it is necessary to introduce an act of free self-determination which cannot be further determined. This act is the absolute act of free will which is primordial and infinite. It is with this act the theoretical and practical philosophy is united.

In the same year Schelling published his  Naturphilosophie that further elaborates the concept of organism through analysis of natural phenomena with the help of scientific studies of the day. This work responds to the dual tasks mentioned above. On the one hand it must give an account of a dynamic process of the emergence of nature as against the mechanistic, deterministic understanding of nature; and on the other hand, to resolve the problem left by Kant, that of bridging the realm of theoretical and practical philosophy by developing a dynamic philosophy of nature that takes into account Fichtean dialectical philosophy of consciousness. Like the Treatise of the same year, this new philosophy of nature is not grounded in the self-positing, unconditioned self-consciousness but by positing a “non-objective”, unconditioned in nature itself which Schelling calls “productivity”. It is this productivity that emerges through the logic of polar oppositions between subject and object that is shown to lead to a higher subject-object synthesis. For Schelling such a dialectical logic is deducted as a movement of potencies. The first potency is the movement of infinite to the finite. The second potency makes the reverse movement, while the third potency alone, which is higher than the other two, unities preceding potencies. In this manner Schelling explains magnetism as the first potency, electricity as the second and chemistry as the third potency that dialectically sublates the other two. Schelling’s philosophy of nature that attempts to develop the dynamic process of Idealism from the objective side can be seen as a parallel development to the Subjective Idealism that is elaborated by Fichte.

In the Treatise Explicatory of the Idealism in the “Science of Knowledge” of 1797 Schelling hints at the idea of “the history of self-consciousness”. The Spirit through its originary activity presents the infinite in the finite, a movement whose goal is self-consciousness that marks the unification of theoretical and practical philosophy, nature and history. Schelling perfects this model in his System of Transcendenatl Idealism.   Schelling’s publication of The System of Transcendental Idealism in 1800 brought immediate fame to the young 25 year old philosopher. Schelling here draws from Fichte’s great insight that self-consciousness is not a mere “given entity”. It is not an unknown and inaccessible X,  a mysterious transcendental “in-itself” as the formal ground of cognition, but a coming into presence of itself, a pure self-positing emergence through the dialectical process of self-positing and self-limitation. In that way a “history of self-consciousness” can be deduced from one principle that explains the coming into being of the theoretical cognition that at its limit passes into the practical realm of freedom, that is, the objective world of history . This is the task of Schelling’s System of Transcendental Idealism of 1800. Thus the axiomatic sense of Fichtean I=I is transformed into the dynamic deduction of the self-consciousness by one principle. This is emergence of the Idealist notion of System whose possibility, according to the Idealists, is already given in Kantian Critical philosophy; a possibility is denied by Kant himself.

“The history of self-consciousness” comes into being in three stages or epochs. While the first epoch manifests the coming into being of “productive intuition” from “original sensation” and the second epoch manifests the emergence of “reflection” from “productive intuition”, the third epoch recounts the emergence of “the absolute act of will” from “reflection”. At the end of the third epoch, “the history of self-consciousness” passes into the practical realm where the deduction of the concept of history is shown to be the realm of unity of freedom and necessity. This has led Schelling to ask at the end of System: how the Subject which is now a completed self-consciousness can become conscious of that moment of its origin which is now unconscious for it, a past that appears to have receded into an immemorial origin and is inaccessible? It now appears that the condition of possibility of consciousness as such remains irreducible to consciousness itself. This is the problem that has become decisive, not only for Schelling’s subsequent philosophical career, but for the fate of Idealism as such. It now appears as if our self-consciousness is driven or constituted by an unconscious ground, forever inaccessible to consciousness, which can never be grounded in consciousness itself.

For Schelling this shows the limit of philosophical cognition and at the same time the importance of works of art. By refusing the claim to say or represent the synthesis of unconscious and conscious, the work of art rather shows it. Therefore art can be said to be the “the eternal organ and document of philosophy” whose basic character is an “unconscious infinity” that arises in the work of art’s synthesis of nature and freedom. While the artist initiates a work of art with a manifest, conscious intention, she, in an unconscious and unintentional manner, depicts infinity without representing or saying it. Such an unintentional showing exceeds the representational acts of consciousness. It cannot be reduced to categorical statements. Therefore works of art cannot be understood on the basis of pre-given set of rules. Works of art are not exhausted in the normative or axiomatic definitions as to ‘what constitutes art as such’. What constitutes the ‘essence’ of art lies rather in its excess of showing over the said. In that sense works of art are more analogous with organisms by virtue of its existing as a link between unconsciousness and consciousness. Such a link can only be shown and therefore remains irreducible to the propositional character of judgment. Schelling develops such insights further in his lectures on The Philosophy of Art (1802), two years after The System of Transcendental Idealism . Unlike Hegel’s lectures on Aesthetics where Hegel argues that “the work of art is a thing of the past” in so far as it no longer has an essential relation to the Absolute even though works of art will continue to be produced, and thus pass into the sobriety of philosophy’s Absolute Knowledge, Schelling sees works of art and philosophy as manifesting the differential mode of the Absolute where art retains an essential, singular and irreducible role.

b. Identity Philosophy

In 1795,  Friedrich Hölderlin published an article called On Judgment and Being that has proved to be of decisive importance for the later development of German Idealism. In this small article Hölderlin attempts to think of an Absolute identity, a prior and originary ground of consciousness that cannot be grasped or known within the immanence of self-consciousness. Hölderlin calls this originary identity “being”( Seyn) which he distinguishes from Judgment ( das Urteil). Hölderlin here attempts to think of an originary identity that grounds the reflective judgment. According to Hölderlin this reflective judgment which is the unity of a disjunction, separation or difference between the subject and the object, must already presuppose an originary identity before judgment. In so far as judgment presupposes the difference between the subject and the object of consciousness, it must already be grounded in an identity. This identity is being (Seyn) which, because of its ground character, remains irreducible to the reflective consciousness. In order for judgment to be possible, it must be grounded in a principle that exceeds judgment itself. This originary identity is being which is before or without consciousness.

In his Identity philosophy, Schelling too attempts to move beyond the immanence of self-consciousness and the circle of reflective judgment. With this move, Schelling decisively breaks away from the Fichtean subjective Idealism. The question of ‘I’ is no longer the point of departure, unlike that of Fichte’s absolute ‘I’ that is not an inert substance but arises purely in the act of self-positing. Rather, here it is the question of consciousness as a result of a process which is to be grasped not merely from the side of the Subject of self-consciousness but from the other side as well. This relation between subject and object thus can no longer be grounded within self-consciousness itself but in an absolute indifference that is prior to this distinction and hence, that can only be presupposed but is never accessible to reflective judgment or to the categories of understanding. Unlike that of reflective philosophy, the question is no longer that of making a correspondence between the subject and the object of consciousness. Such a representational philosophy of correspondence is here abandoned. The problem is rather that of explaining the manifestation of a finite world from a ground that is forever excluded from the infinite chain of conditioned, finite, particular entities. In order not to fall into dualism, which Jacobi alludes is the dualism between the unconditioned ground on the one hand and the infinite chain of conditioned, finite entities on the other, Schelling has to explain the manifestation of the finite world out of its unconditioned ground, from an absolute indifference, without falling into the logic of reflective thinking which Hegel later uses to develop in his Phenomenology of Spirit. This is the emergence of the finite world of entities that are connected to each other in an infinite chain of predicates from an originary indifference which is unconditioned. This emergence is not a smooth transition but a qualitative leap, a diversion, a falling away (Abfall) from its originary ground. Later in his critique of Hegel, Schelling argues that such a leap cannot be understood on the basis of Hegelian modality of dialectical negativity that arrives at absolute knowledge only on the basis of the self-cancellation of the finite.

Perhaps the most lucid and systematic exposition of Schelling Identity philosophy will be found in his posthumously published lecture called The System of Philosophy in General and of the Philosophy of Nature in Particular (1804). Schelling gave this lecture during his brief years of stay at Würzburg. Schelling here begins with the proposition which according to him is the first presupposition of all knowledge, that is: “the knower and that which is known are the same”. This proposition immediately puts into question the correspondence theory of truth and knowledge that was dominant at that time. The correspondence theory of knowledge posits two principles – the subject and the object of knowledge – which are then sought to be reconciled in a higher synthetic principle. According to Schelling, once this dualism is posited, the possibility of knowledge itself becomes inexplicable. Therefore Schelling begins with an absolute identity of the known and the knower, an identity that cannot be posited within subjectivity. With this notion of absolute identity beyond subjectivity, Schelling definitely breaks with Fichte’s Subjective Idealism and Kant’s reflective philosophy. Distinguishing his Identitätssystem from both Empiricism and merely subjective Idealism, Schelling here introduces the notion of the Absolute that has proved to be of crucial importance for German Idealism in general. The absolute identity is the unconditional identity of the subject and the object, idea and Being, Ideal and Real both at once, immediately posited and not discreetly. As immediate knowledge of the absolute, this system of identity is distinguished from what Schelling calls “common sense understanding”.

The common sense understanding distinguishes conditional knowledge, which is synthetic, real knowledge from unconditional knowledge, which is analytic and thus is no real knowledge. Here common sense understanding comes to an irresolvable aporia: either I have real, objective knowledge, but then I renounce the unconditional; or, I have the unconditional in which case it is merely subjective and thus is no real knowledge. According to Schelling, this irresolvable aporia is the aporia of Kantian philosophy  which Kantian dogmatism can never resolve. This demands a move beyond Kant’s critical philosophy. This move which inaugurates German Idealism consists of going beyond the mediated knowledge of the Absolute to the immediate knowledge of the Absolute which is an immediate affirmation of this affirmation. As immediate knowledge of the absolute, Reason is Absolute Knowledge. From this idea Hegel’s notion of the Absolute is not far.  Unlike Kant’s regulative idea of Reason, Reason here is the idea of God as an immediate, absolute, unconditional identity. The immediate awareness of the Spirit of its absolute will which can never be further grounded in concept, is what Schelling calls in this essay ‘intellectual intuition’. It is intuition because it is not yet mediated by concept, and it is intellectual because it goes beyond the empirical in that it has as its predicate its self-affirmation. As the unconditional ground of all knowledge, ‘intellectual intuition’ does not belong even to inner sense. Thus what Fichte calls ‘intellectual intuition’ is no longer seen here as belonging to the inner sense but to the unconditional absolute which is beyond the circle of self-consciousness. “The fact of consciousness” is not originary, for there must already be a priori identity before differences come to manifest in consciousness. The essence of Reason can be said to be ‘intellectual intuition’ whose object is exclusively the absolute which is monolithic, one and only substance. By virtue of this affirmation, Reason recognizes “the eternal impossibility of non-being”. Being is not a predicate of God as something lying outside or exterior, but God and being is immediately, unconditionally one without duration. This absolute identity is infinite by virtue of its idea. Therefore God can neither be thought as the end result of the self-negation of difference, nor being involved in a process of emanation. The indivisibility and univocity of God is neither a numerical concept nor a concept of totality as aggregate unity of finite particulars. This is because the indivisibility and univocity of God is the ground for infinite divisibility in form or in accidents. How can the existence of finite, particulars be explained within Identitätssystem?

In regard to the absolute identity, these finite, particulars are surely non-being, non-ens, non-essentials that can neither subtract nor add anything to the essence of the being who is the absolute substance. The existence of the finite, particulars can only be understood, not as modification of essence, but as modifications in form. They are non-being in respect to the universal which is absolute identity, but considered independently, they are not completely devoid of being. They are in part being and in part non-being. As such they are “real” or “concrete” things, irreducibly finite, particular, multiple, whose ground of existence does not lie within themselves but in that absolute identity of Being and essence. Schelling here deduces the finitude of particulars which ‘common sense understanding’ calls ‘actuality’, not as a process of emanation from the absolute identity, but as negativity that adheres in all finite things. Since these finite things cannot have positivity of being within themselves, they must therefore always relate themselves to other finite things, all sensuous cognition of them can only be non-cognition. Schelling here radically departs from Kant. For Kant all cognition is cognition of the sensible but not of the supersensible. By contrast Schelling argues that all of our sensory knowledge is only a privation of knowledge, or rather, “a negation of knowledge”. Hegel argues in a similar manner in Phenomenology of Spirit (1807) where he shows in a dialectical manner, the vanity of the supposed certitude of sensuous cognition.

One can present the schema of Schelling’s Identitätssystem as follows. God as absolute identity is an essential, qualitative identity. Absolute indifference follows from this essential identity of the absolute. Therefore, absolute indifference is not in-itself essential but a quantitative identity. There is thus a difference between absolute identity and absolute indifference. The opposition between real and ideal, subject and object arises out of this indifference. This is the birth of the finite world. Schelling here introduces the theory of potencies in triplicates that are “the necessary modes of appearances of the real and ideal universes”. While the potencies in triplicates are “the necessary modes of appearances” of the finite universes, they are not applicable to the absolute identity. The absolute identity is thus without potency or devoid of power. The potencies are those modes of appearances that make manifest the non-essential. Therefore they all have equal dignity in relation to the absolute. No potency has priority over the others temporally, for they are not posited successively in a genetic sequence but simultaneously, with equal primordiality. As such, they constitute a circle where all the potencies are posited together but not in an equal manner. Each time the potencies are posited, a particular potency predominates, subjugating the others to their relative non-being. At another time another potency predominates in an alternate manner, always returning to the same and always going away, always being attracted and repulsed, always contracted and expanded in an alternate, circular manner. In this alternating,  rotatory movement of potencies the Real principle comes first as the ground or condition of the Ideal Universe. The Ideal universe then overcomes the Real principle, its conditioning and grounding factor, by relegating it to its relative non-being. Only the higher synthetic principle can unify both the Real and Ideal universes by inhering in both and yet separating each from the other. Schelling presents the theory of potency in the following formula:



A2 =  (A=B)


A=B  :   The domination of the Real or affirmed. It is A1

A2     :    The domination of the Ideal

A3     :    Indifference between the other two

With the theory of potencies Schelling explains the existence of the finite universes which are originally one. Their existence is neither completely being nor nothing, but a relative being and relative non-being. As relative being and relative non-being, potencies exceed each time from the immanence of self-presence. They never arrive at the absolute equilibrium of forces without ceasing themselves to be potencies. The circle of the potencies never comes to standstill, or that they do not come out of the circle unless a will superior to this circle of the conditioned existence breaks in.

Three years after this lecture, Hegel published his magnum opus Phenomenology of Spirit. In his Phenomenology of Spirit published in 1807, Hegel apparently criticizes Schelling’s notion of the Absolute indifference as “the night where all cows are black”. In a letter to Hegel, Schelling asks Hegel to clarify in the Preface to the Phenomenology whether this criticism is applied to him or to others who misuse Schelling’s ideas. Hegel did not incorporate this clarification in the subsequent edition of Phenomenology that the criticism is applied, not to Schelling, but to others. This led to the break in the friendship between the two philosophers who shared the same room at Tübingenstift. While this friendship was profoundly important and fruitful for both of them, the bitterness proved to be equally decisive for the development of  their singular modes of thinking, one leading to the task of systematic completion of the metaphysics of the Subject, the other leading to the attempt to inaugurate a new thinking beyond such a metaphysics of the Subject.

c. The Middle period

Published in 1809, Philosophical Inquiries into the Nature of Human Freedom is perhaps the most important book that Schelling published in his life time. Along with Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, Fichte’s Science of Knowledge, and Kant’s Critique of Judgment, this essay is one of the greatest philosophical achievements of the late 18th and 19th century Germany. Published immediately before the death of Caroline, it evokes “a deep, unappeasable melancholy” that adheres to all finite beings. Here Schelling does not pose the question concerning the essence of human freedom as the dialectical problem between nature and freedom. Freedom does not appear here as the free exercise of the rational Subject’s will to mastery over its sensuous nature, but as the capacity to do evil. The question thus posed is no longer one question amongst others but the metaphysical question concerning the possibility of a system of freedom. On the one hand, freedom appears to be that which cannot be included within a system at all; on the other hand, the demand of Idealism that there must be a system without which nothing is adequately comprehensible is not to be renounced. The essay attempts to reconcile these two incommensurable demands: the demand of the unconditionality of freedom that grounds being and the demand of the grounding act of the system. This attempt at the system of freedom arose in the wake of what came to be known as the “pantheism controversy”.

The pantheism controversy is centred on the supposedly atheistic figure of Spinoza. During the late 18th century, and early 19th century, the dominant understanding of Spinoza was that of a pantheist and consequently an atheist. It is understood that within the pantheistic system of Spinoza’s ethics wherein God is immediately identified with the world, there is no place for the affirmation of God as unconditional reality. If the world is only a totality of conditioned, finite beings, then the unconditioned existence of God cannot be understood to be immediately identifiable with the world, and consequently with any dogmatic, rational system.  In the famous pantheism controversy, Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi attempted to show that a system of rational knowledge never arrives at the unconditioned since, for such a system, the unconditioned can only arise as a result of a process where the one conditioned leads to other conditioned in an infinite chain of negativity. To be properly concerned with the unconditioned, one must begin with the unconditioned itself  which no rational knowledge ever attains. For Jacobi it is only the leap of faith beyond the system of rational knowledge that enables us to open to the unconditionality of the absolute being. Therefore all system of rational knowledge for Jacobi is nihilism. Jacobi thereby becomes the first to use the word “nihilism” that arose in the context of the pantheism controversy.

Schelling here agrees with Jacobi about the limit of purely rational attainment of the unconditioned. Schelling, however, disagrees with Jacobi’s use of a limited and restricted notion of ‘system’ and ‘freedom’, along with Jacobi’s restricted use of the metaphysical and logical notion of judgment. In the Freedom essay Schelling attempts to re-interpret the logical and metaphysical notion of judgment in such a manner that it opens up to the unconditioned character of freedom without renouncing the demand of a system. Such a system must, on the one hand, be other than a purely formal, lifeless realism of Spinoza; and on the other hand, it must be otherwise than a conventional system of idealism that reduces the dynamic character of freedom and the world into pure rational necessity. Only a dynamic notion of the system that affirms the exuberance of life and the generosity of freedom can truly be system. The formal, rational notion of freedom as the intelligible principle that overcomes sensuous impulses must be opened to the ontological question of the beings in their becoming. The question of judgment is thus no longer merely a formal logical question but the question of the jointure, or bond of beings. This bond or jointure of beings is grounded in freedom which, understood in more originary manner, is not arbitrary free will but that belongs together with highest necessity. This jointure of beings – the infinite, creative being of God and the finite, created being called ‘man’ – must be  essentially a free relation, a relation that is governed by freedom which in the highest sense is also necessity. If man is free in a certain manner, then this manner is also the manner of man’s individuation. This is to say that to the extent that man is individuated by freedom, man’s freedom is distinguishable from the absolute freedom of the infinite, eternal being called God. This peculiar essence of human freedom is the capacity to do evil.

According to Schelling, the human is distinguished from the eternal creative God by the specificity of his freedom which is essentially and inextricably a finite freedom. God is the being whose condition, though never completely immanent, can be actualized in its very existing. On the other hand, the finite being can never actualize itself completely because the ground of its existence remains inappropriable. This is the source of the fundamental melancholy of all finite beings. The distinction between the absolute freedom of the eternal being and the finite freedom of the mortal can be better understood with the help of Schelling’s distinction between the ground of existence and existence itself. This is not a formal distinction between sensuous nature and intelligible will, but a dynamic distinction of freedom. Eternal or finite, each being is a jointure of  the ground of existence and existence itself. In the eternal, creative being, this jointure is indissoluble. In the mortal, however, there can occur dissolution of this jointure. It is the possibility of the dissolution of the principles that explains the finitude of the finite being, and the freedom of this finite being. The human is essentially finite being, and only such a finite being is capable of evil. Therefore evil is neither divine nor beastly but essentially belongs to the human freedom. Evil has this peculiar, specific relation to human finitude. Unlike the beasts in whom the jointure of the principles is governed by necessity, and unlike the divine in whom the jointure of the principles is indissoluble, human freedom partakes of the divine freedom and is yet separated by an abyss. According to Schelling, this abyss is the possibility of dissolution of the principles.

In the dynamic freedom there are two oppositional principles that never reach equilibrium. In the coming to existence of the finite being there adhere these oppositional principles. There is the dark principle which is the principle of ground, and there is the ideal principle of light. The dark principle that operates in the realm of history as the principle of particularity is the principle of evil. Man is the finite being that unites in himself both of these principles in an equal measure. Since the nexus (band) of these principles in him is free and not governed by necessity, man is free to bring permutation to this nexus. Therefore what ought to remain as mere condition of existence, as mere principle of particularity, man can seek to elevate to totality or to universal domination. Out of this self-affirmation of the finite being who in this self-affirmation seeks to abnegate its very finitude, there arises evil. Thus while the possibility of evil is given to man in the coming into existence of this being, to actualize this principle of possibility is the work of human freedom. As mere ground, this principle is the very source of creative joy and affirmation of life, but elevating it into the universality or totality results into the most terrible form of evil that seeks to negate any form of its life-affirmative character. Thus the source of life and the origin of evil is grounded in the same principle. This principle is the human freedom whose origin remains unfathomable for man. According to Schelling, this unfathomable, inappropriable, unconditional freedom ought to remain inappropriable and unconditional, for the human creates a conditioned world on the basis of the unconditioned freedom. This conditioned world is history. By beginning this new “covenant”, man partakes the creativity of the divine freedom. This is the source of creative joy for the human, for through this creative act of human, the world of nature is redeemed.  But in his vain arrogance and in his self-affirmation that is pushed to the point of absolutization and totalization, the human seeks to negate the finite character of his freedom and thereby seeks to elevate the principle of particularity to the universal domination. Herein lays the evil when the non-being, which is for that matter is not completely devoid of being, seeks to attain the complete, absolute being. Evil is therefore neither being nor nothing, but non-being’s malicious hunger for being. Therefore power of evil cannot be said to be the power of being. It is rather the power of non-being that seeks to devour itself and is never satisfied at any point, because it never reaches being without a remainder of non-being. More it does not reach being, more self-consuming becomes its lust. According to Schelling such is the character of evil.

In The Ages of the World which was written between 1809-1827 and is  found in various incomplete versions, Schelling develops a narrative method that seeks to recount the stages of the world’s becoming through the agonal movement of conflictual forces. This is the germ of Schelling’s theory of potencies. The world as it exists has its ground in a dark, unfathomable past which no work of human reason can ever elevate into thought. This non-reason is not irrationality that is opposed to reason nor is it the negation of the possibility of reason but the ground of reason. Human reason thus exists only as a “regulated madness”. On account of its immanent force alone the human reason cannot attain the unconditioned which is the realm of absolute freedom. The emergence of the world-order is not seen as an immanent order ruled by the necessary principles of reason but has its source in an absolute, unconditional freedom. This freedom can arrive to the finite, mortal being as a gift. Man can never master this gift, because it opens man to his historicity. The essence of history is freedom. “The ages of the world” thus arises out of the unconditional character of freedom. This principle of freedom manifests itself in the agonal movement of contradictory forces, one repulsive and the other attractive. It is this agonal movement of oppositional forces that makes possible the emergence of “the ages of the world” out of the unconditional. This unconditional is that which cannot be further grounded in thought or in self-consciousness, it is what Schelling in his Freedom essay calls “the indivisible remainder” that constantly solicits from finite human beings ‘awe’ or ‘respect’.

Here as elsewhere Schelling’s thought wrestles with the question of the unconditioned. If there is anything that is singular to Schelling’s whole of philosophy, and that unifies Schelling’s often discontinuous philosophical career, it is this question of the unconditioned. Schelling does not explain the existence of the world with the help of logical categories. For Schelling, a rational system constitutive of logical categories cannot explicate the facticity or actuality of the world. It is the unconditional character of freedom whose ground is groundless (Abgrund), this freedom alone opens the world. Therefore there is always something excessive about freedom. In many texts, especially in his 1797 treatise, Schelling evokes a freedom which is not only a promise for the human but also a danger (Gefahr). “The ages of the world” is grounded by a condition which is excessive and unthinkable. The human belongs to the “un-pre-thinkable” ( Unvordenkliche). This is a promise as well as danger. Schelling evokes this excess to explain the possibility of the world and finite existence. This unconditional excess makes the world and being-in-the world as essentially finite and irreducibly mortal. It is this aspect of Schelling’s work that has most profoundly influenced the twentieth century philosophers like Franz Rosenzweig and Martin Heidegger.

d. Positive Philosophy

On 14 November 1831 Hegel died in Berlin. In 1840 Schelling was called to the now vacant chair in Berlin to replace Hegel. The following year Schelling began his lectures on  “positive philosophy” (Positivphilosophie) which was attended by Kierkegaard, Bakunin, Humboldt and Engels. These lectures were delivered in three phases:  Grounding of Positive Philosophy that introduces and grounds Positive Philosophy vis-à-vis the history of Negative Philosophy from Descartes onwards, followed by Philosophy of Mythology (Philosophie der Mythologie) and Philosophy of Revelation ( Philosophie der Offenbarung).

Schelling’s grounding of Positive Philosophy begins with the distinction between the “what” of being and “that being”. “What” of being is being as essence and “that” being is the contingent being’s pure actuality of existence. This actuality is not an attribute of being but its  existentiality, the very facticity of its coming into being. From here comes the distinction between a negative philosophy, that is, the rational philosophy that is essentially concerned with the essence of being (its ‘what’ character) and the positive philosophy that is concerned with the pure actuality of the existence of “that” being which comes into its being. Such a being (“that” being) is not a settled entity that is given, but that which comes into being . Schelling calls such a coming into being, existence. Since this coming into being is not a finished entity but yet becoming and always contingent, it cannot be grasped in the concept. Therefore existence and movement cannot be a logical category. There is a concept only if a being already exists, for by definition concept can only grasp the essence of being which in turn is possible if such a being already exists. Understood in this sense, negative philosophy is not concerned with the facticity of something that exists at all. Therefore it is not concerned with the question “why something exists at all?” The negative philosophy is rather concerned with the question: if and if something exists, what is its essence, what is the “being” character of this being irrespective of the problem whether such a being exists as “this” being at all.

For example, when Kant argues against the ontological proof of God, he argues neither for the existence of God nor for its non-existence. He only argues that the concept of God is not extendable to the existence of God because ‘existence’ cannot be predicated. In so far as ‘existence’ cannot be predicated, its actuality or facticity can only be for rational philosophy a presupposition. This presupposition is a point of beginning whose existence can only be deduced only if such an existence is already granted; only if such and such a being has already revealed itself. What then Kant’s philosophy shows, for Schelling, is the limit of negative philosophy, a limit that constitutes the possibility of negative philosophy. Schelling does not contest the possibility of negative philosophy, but precisely demands it however, on the condition that it recognizes this limit that is constitutive of it and does not pretend to be able to constitute itself as absolute system that includes the concept as well as existence of being. What Schelling finds problematic in Hegel is not that there should not be negative philosophy, but of Hegel’s claim to include existence in a system that is logical and purely negative system. For Schelling, Hegel’s extension of his negative notion of system to the Absolute totality without outside is without justification. For Schelling there always remains a remainder of such a system of negativity, which is the positivity of existence. Hegel’s system is founded upon purely negative relation of the finite being in relation to other finite beings where the unconditioned is supposed to be reached as a self-negation of negation. According to this conception, the unconditioned is the end result of a process of the self-cancellation of finite, conditioned entities. As early as 1804 in a lecture in Würzburg on The System of Philosophy in General Schelling contests this idea of the absolute as the end result of a process of the self-negation of finitude. According to Schelling, such a system is based upon a false premise and a presupposition. It presupposes to have reached the unity of being and thought, while it reaches such a unity merely in thought that means, only from negative side. It leaves out the pure actuality of existence whose unconditional character of its being cannot be merely the result of a dialectical process of the self-cancellation of finitude. Unlike Hegel’s claim, a purely negative philosophy cannot be presupposition-less. It presupposes what it cannot incorporate within its systemic edifice. This limitation of negative philosophy demands a positive philosophy that begins with the unconditionality of existence, with a prius whose existence can only be proved posteriori once there is a manifest world. Schelling called  such a positive philosophy, “metaphysical Empiricism”.  Hence the idea of a positive philosophy is where the ground is a presupposition. This presupposition is the unconditional existence of being whose pure actuality no rational knowledge based upon potentiality can ever attain. While the philosophical concept that is essentially concerned with essence can only elaborate the possibility of being, the actuality of being itself is beyond such categorical cognition, for the existence of this being exists as absolute freedom and not as a necessary consequence of a concept.

Here the limit of the Idealist notion of system is reached. Schelling in these lectures shows that the (Hegelian ) notion of the Subject presupposes as its condition that which cannot be further grounded in the Subject itself. One then has to begin from the pure actuality of existence, from a facticity, which is already always before self-consciousness and before thought’s ability to grasp it in the concept. This immemoriality of the origin is the “exuberance of being” that elicits from us awe or respect ( Achtung), because it exposes us to the Infinite that unconditionally and groundlessly exists. It thereby exposes us to our own finitude and mortality.

3. Influences

How deeply Schelling’s later philosophy has influenced Kierkegaard cannot be shown by quoting Kierkegaard or from Kierkegaard’s self-understanding. This can better be shown by understanding Kierkegaard’s anti-systematic notions of “existence”, “temporality” and “finitude” that he understands to be irreducible to the general order of the system. Like Schelling, Kierkegaard understands the question of existence as the highest question of philosophy. There is in existence something that cannot be grasped in the predicative. Likewise, in the realm of history there is a preponderant mass of contingencies that cannot be completely and exhaustively accounted by the speculative dialectical logic. The Post-Schellingian philosophies that are concerned with this problem have the source of their inspiration in Schelling’s later works. For Schelling neither history nor existence is a homogenous process leading straight, necessarily, to a telos of absolute knowledge by irresistible law which is auto-generative and anonymous. History is rather a field of polemos where agonal forces are at work. Kierkegaard’s The Concept of Anxiety begins with a Schellingian note. Kierkegaard here argues, in a manner that recalls Schelling’s critique of Hegel, that the notion of movement does not allow itself to be thought within the immanent speculative logic of Hegel, for the true movement presupposes transcendence which by definition a logical category cannot grasp. The task of Kierkegaard’s philosophy is to open towards an Archimedean point outside totality, or outside the general, normative order of validity. That point cannot be attained within the realm of the ethical, that is, within the homogenous order of universal norms, but in a “quantum leap” of faith. That leap of faith must pass through an existential experience of anxiety (Angst) which no phenomenology of spirit can thematize.

This anxiety has family resemblance with Schelling’s notion of anxiety of the mortal who constantly flees from the fire of the centre and takes shelter in the periphery. In Schelling as well as in Kierkegaard, especially in his Fear and Trembling, this anxiety manifests the irreducible finitude of the mortal being who is seized by the gaze of the wholly other, the divine, holding his hand, tearing him out of the totality of finite knowledge. In his Concluding Unscientific Postscript Kierkegaard attempts to open this universal order of the ethical to the notion of subjectivity, the subjectivity of that singular individual for whom transcendence of the wholly other is an existential interest. This existential interest, argues Kierkegaard, cannot be addressed within the immanent order of the system. One of the most prominent tendencies of the post-Schellingian philosophy is this question of existence from the religious point of view. For Schelling himself the question of religion remains irreducible to the rational-logical system of knowledge. The transcendence of the absolute cannot be reduced to a theodicy of history. As early as 1804, Schelling warned in his Philosophy and Religion against the danger of the acts of legitimacy by the earthly power in the name of the embodiment of the divine in the profane body. Religion for Schelling, as for Kierkegaard remains irreducible to the violence of a historical reason that constantly evokes a theological foundation for the justification of its domination. As against this theologico-political foundation, Kierkegaard evokes the whole other God. Thus religion cannot be used as the foundation of the profane in order to legitimize the power of earthly sovereignty, because religion essentially opens us to a non-foundation that eternally delegitimizes any earthly power, like the power of the State. In his 1804 lecture Philosophy and Religion and in his Stuttgart lectures of 1810, Schelling raises this important theologico-political question that has profound significance for our contemporary historical world. The recent upsurge of the question of political theology attempts to go back to Schelling to see how Schelling helps us to think of a critique of historical reason.

Such a question is pursued further by Franz Rosenzweig, a German Jewish philosopher who is contemporary of Martin Heidegger. Rosenzweig’s first scholarly work was his doctoral thesis on Hegel called Hegel and the State. In the wake of his horror of the First World War, Rosenzweig soon abandoned Hegelianism; his The Star of Redemption, which he wrote on post cards to his mother  when he was in the Balkan Front, is an anti-Hegelian work. In this book, that evokes Schelling’s later works as one of the main sources of inspiration, Rosenzweig envisions the messianic notion of history and redemption beyond the closure of a historical-speculative reason. This remarkable book begins with the question of existence which he takes from Schelling’s later works. It is the notion of the individual, finite existence whose fear of death cannot be consoled by the concept of the universal history. This demands opening up the closure of the universal historical reason to the arrival of redemption that is always to come. This eternity which is always to come, that alone can redeem the violence of a historical reason, does not itself belong to the “Philosophy of the All”. Rosenzweig’s critique of “the philosophy of the All” begins with Schellingian critique of Hegel, that existence precedes thought and thus it cannot be enclosed within the All. It is what falls outside totality or system, and in this manner opens the world to the messianic event of pure future. The messianic arrival of eternity does not allow itself to be reduced to the theological foundation of the profane order, like the power of the State. Thus the State is no longer an expression of the Absolute. Like Schelling, Rosenzweig’s later works are deeply suspicious of the theodicy of history that legitimizes the political sovereignty of the State.

The question of existence is important for Martin Heidegger’s early philosophical works. What Heidegger calls in his early works “hermeneutics of facticity” has resonance with Schelling’s notion of actuality of “that”, the pre-predicative, pre-conceptual and pre-categorical disclosure. The existential analytic of Dasein that Heidegger elaborates in his Being and Time and his deconstruction of the metaphysical foundation of logic has inspiration in Schelling’s attempt to open the system of negative philosophy to the more  originary revelation of being. Schelling’s positive philosophy seeks to release philosophy beyond its metaphysical foundation in the logic of the thinkable to a disclosure that can only be shown a posteriori . In this sense Schelling’s metaphysical empiricism is at once an exit from the metaphysics founded upon the notion of the predicative truth. What both Heidegger and Rosenzweig have sought to complete is this exit from metaphysics.  Heidegger’s 1936 lecture on Schelling shows the real importance of Schelling’s thinking for him.

The exit from metaphysics is a fundamental problem even for Marx. Ernst Bloch, whom Jürgen Habermas calls “Schellingian Marxist”, combines a certain version of Marxism and messianism that envisions a utopian fulfilment oriented towards the “not yet”. His The Spirit of Utopia and his later work The Principle of Hope evoke a notion of history that is disruptive, opening to the “not yet”, a fundamental affirmation of future which Schelling always insisted as the very creative, free task of philosophy. While Schelling has attempted to open the radical notion of future in a certain eschatological-theological manner, Bloch’s messianism is essentially an atheistic eschatology.

Schelling’s influence is seen to be growing in our contemporary philosophical world. Thus Jean Louis Chrétien, the French philosopher, has drawn on Schelling from a certain phenomenological perspective. In his Unforgettable and the Unhoped for, Chrétien is concerned with the immemoriality of a promise that arrives from the extremity of time, from an eschatos of future always to come. Chrétien draws here on Schelling’s notion of the eternal past which has not come to pass but that is always a past, an immemorial past that, being the principle of foundation, always opens the world to its futurity. Schelling indeed develops such a notion of an immemorial past in his The Ages of the World. Like Schelling in his various texts, Chrétien too evokes Plato’s notion of Anamnesis as remembrance, not of what has passed, but what has immemorially opened us to truth. What has found us, the excess that opens us to the world, is immemorially lost. For both Schelling and Chrétien, this is not the occasion of despair but the occasion of a creative freedom and the possibility of future.  In recent years the Anglophone philosophical world has been witnessing increased attention to Schelling’s works. This shows the continuing relevance of Schelling in our contemporary historical existence. Schelling’s philosophy has come to be interpreted and understood as a philosophy of affirmation and a philosophy of the exuberance of life as against petrified system of concepts. Jason Wirth’s recent work on Schelling rightly emphasizes the contemporaneity of Schelling for our concerns: our ethical concern with the primacy of Good over truth, the affirmation of life beyond the instrumental use of Reason, the affirmation of the more originary ecstatic temporality, and our deep ecological concerns. The ‘unconscious’ has psychoanalysis speaks of, evokes the notion of ‘unconscious’ in Schelling, the abyss that cannot be further grounded, and hence is unground. In Jacques Lacan’s term, it is the Real that never stops haunting, destabilizing and disturbing the symbolic order of the world. “The indivisible remainder” that Schelling speaks of in his 1809 Freedom essay  is that element of eternal nature as ground that never ceases de-constituting the cultural-historical order of totality. The symbolic order of a restrictive Reason never reaches totality, but always opens to an eternal remnant outside. This question has profound importance of Schelling for our time.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling's Sämmtliche Werke, ed. K.F.A. Schelling, I Abtheilung Vols. 1-10, II Abtheilung Vols. 1-4, Stuttgart: Cotta, 1856-61.
  • Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling, Ausgewählte Schriften, 6 Vols., ed. Manfred   Frank, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp 1985.
  • Aus Schellings Leben. In Briefen (three volumes), Adamant Media Corporations, 2003.
  • The Unconditional in Human Knowledge: Four early essays 1794-6 , trans. F. Marti, Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press, 1980.
  • Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature: as Introduction to the Study of this Science , trans. E.E. Harris and P. Heath with an introduction R. Stern, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1797/1988.
  • System of Transcendental Idealism, trans. P. Heath with an introduction by M. Vater, Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia, 1800/1978.
  • Bruno, or On the Natural and the Divine Principle of Things , trans. with an introduction by M. Vater, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1802/1984.
  • The Philosophy of Art , Minnesota: Minnesota University Press, 1802-03/1989.
  • On University Studies , trans. E.S. Morgan, ed. N. Guterman, Athens, Ohio: Ohio University Press, 1803/ 1966.
  • Philosophical Inquiries into the Nature of Human Freedom, trans. With an introduction by J. Gutmann, Chicago: Open Court, 1809/1936.
  • Clara : or On Nature’s Connection to the Spirit World, trans. Fiona Steinkamp, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1811/2002.
  • The Ages of the World, trans. Jason M. Wirth, Albany: State University of New York, 1811-15/2000.
  • The Ages of the World , trans. F. de W. Bolman, jr., New York: Columbia University Press, 1811-15/1967.
  • The Deities of Samothrace’ , trans. R.F. Brown, Missoula, Mont.: Scholars Press, 1815/1977.
  • On the History of Modern Philosophy, trans. Andrew. Bowie, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1833-4/1994.
  • Philosophie der Offenbarung . ed. M. Frank, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1841-2/1977.
  • Historical-Critical  Introduction  to  the  Philosophy  of Mythology,    trans. Richey, M., Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2007.
  • The Grounding of Positive Philosophy: the Berlin Lectures , trans. Bruce Matthews, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2008.
  • Philosophy and Religion , Spring Publications, 2010.
  • Idealism and the Endgame of Theory , trans. Thomas Pfau , Albany: State University of New York, 1994.
  • Philosophy of German Idealism: Fichte, Jacobi and Schelling, ed. Ernst Behler , Contuum, 1987.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Beach, Edward Allen, The Potencies of God(s): Schelling’s Philosophy of Mythology,         Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Behun, William A. The Historical Pivot: Philosophy of History in Hegel, Schelling and Hölderlin , Triad Press, 2006
  • Beiser, Frederick C., German Idealism: Struggle Against Subjectivism , Harvard: Harvard University Press, 2008.
  • Bowie, Andrew, Aesthetics and Subjectivity: from Kant to Nietzsche, Manchester:    Manchester University Press, 1990.
  • Bowie, Andrew, Schelling and Modern European Philosophy: An Introduction,     London: Routledge, 1993
  • Brown, Robert F., The Later Philosophy of Schelling: The Influence of Boehme in the Works of 1809-1815 , The Associated University Press, 1977
  • Courtine, Jean-Francois , Extase de la raison. Essais sur Schelling, Paris, Galilée, 1990
  • Distaso, Leonardo V., The Paradox of Existence : Philosophy and Aesthetics in the Young Schelling, Springer, 2010
  • Esposito, Josephe L., Schelling’s Idealism and Philosophy of Nature, Associated University Press, 1977
  • Fackenheim, Emil, The God Within: Kant, Schelling and Historicity , ed. John W. Burbridge, University of Toronto Press, 1996
  • Frank, Manfred, Der Unendliche Mangel an Sein, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1975
  • Frank, Manfred, Eine Einführung in Schellings Philosophie, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1985
  • Frank, Manfred, Selbstbewußtsein und Selbsterkenntnis, Stuttgart: Reclam, 1991
  • Frank, M. (ed).  with Kurz, G., Materialien zu Schellings philosophischen Anfängen, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1975
  • Freydberg, Bernard, Schelling’s Dialogical Freedom Essay: Provocative Philosophy Then and Now , State University of New York Press, 2009
  • Geldhof, J, Revelation, Reason and Reality: Theological Encounters with Jaspers, Schelling and Baader, Peeters, 2007
  • Goudeli, Kyriaki, Challenges to German Idealism: Schelling, Fichte and Kant, Palgrave Macmillan, 2003
  • Grant, Ian Hamilton, Philosophies of Nature After Schelling, Continuum, 2008
  • Hegel, G.W. F., The Difference between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1977
  • Heidegger, Martin, Schellings Abhandlung über das Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit, Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1971. Schelling’s Treatise on the Essence of Human Freedom, trans. Joan Stambaugh, Athens: Ohio University Press, 1985
  • Heidegger, Martin, Die Metaphysik des Deutschen Idealismus (Schelling), Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1991
  • Henrich, D. Selbstverhältnisse, Stuttgart: Reclam, 1982
  • Horn, Friedemann , Schelling and Swedenborg: Mysticism and German Idealism, trans. George F. Dole , Swedenborg Foundation Publishers, 1997
  • Jaspers, Karl, Schelling: Größe und Verhängnis, Munich: Piper, 1955
  • Kierkegaard, Søren, The Concept of Irony/Schelling Lecture Notes : Kierkegaard’s Writings Vol 2, Princeton University Press, 1992
  • Kosch, Michelle, Freedom and Reason in Kant, Schelling and Kierkegaard, Oxford University Press, 201
  • Lauer, Christopher, Suspension of Reason in Hegel and Schelling, Continuum,201
  • Limnatis, Nectarios G., German Idealism and the Problem of Knowledge: Kant, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel , Springer, 2010
  • Marx, W. , The Philosophy of F.W.J. Schelling: History, System, Freedom, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1984
  • Norman, Judith and Alistair Welchman , ed.  New Schelling , Continuum, 2004
  • O’Meara, Thomas, Romantic Idealism and Roman Catholicism: Schelling and the Theologians, University of Notre Dame Press, 1982
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Author Information

Saitya Brata Das
The University of Delhi

Lotze, Rudolf Hermann

Rudolf Hermann Lotze (1817–1881)

Hermann Lotze was a key figure in the philosophy of the second half of the nineteenth century, influencing practically all the leading philosophical schools of the late nineteenth and the coming twentieth century, including (i) the neo-Kantians; (ii) Brentano and his school; (iii) The British idealists; (iv) William James’s pragmatism; (v) Husserl’s phenomenology; (vi) Dilthey’s philosophy of life; (vii) Frege’s new logic; (viii) the early Cambridge analytic philosophy.

Lotze’s main philosophical significance is as a contributor to an anti-Hegelian objectivist movement in German-speaking Europe. The publication of the first editions of his Metaphysics (1841) and Logic (1843) constituted the third wave of this movement. The first came in 1837, in the form of Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre. The second came three years later, in 1840, when Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg published his Logische Untersuchungen. Lotze’s early works furthered this objectivist line of thought. And when a new surge of philosophical objectivism crested again in the 1870s, Lotze used the opportunity to restate his position in the second editions of his Logic (1874) and of his Metaphysics (1879).

Closely following Trendelenburg, Lotze advanced an objectivist philosophy that did not start from the subject-object opposition in epistemology. He insisted that this opposition  is based on a metaphysical relation that is more fundamental (Schnädelbach 1983, p. 219). In this way, the very possibility for philosophical subjectivism was suspended.

Lotze promoted the “universal inner connection of all reality” by uniting all objects and terms in a comprehensive, ordered arrangement . Especially important to Lotze’s theories of order is the concept of relation.  A favorite saying of his illustrates this point.  “The proposition, ‘things exist’,” he repeatedly said, “has no intelligible meaning except that they stand in relations to each other.”

The priority of orderly relations in Lotze’s ontology entailed that nature is a cosmos, not chaos. Furthermore, since the activity that is typical for humans—thinking—is an activity of relating, man is a microcosm. This point convinced Lotze to jointly study microcosm and macrocosm, a conviction which found expression in his three-volume book on Microcosm (1856/64).

The distinction between the universe as macrocosm and humanity as microcosm gave rise to another central component of Lotze’s philosophy: his anthropological stance.  According to Lotze, the fundamental metaphysical and logical problems of philosophy are to be discussed and answered through the lens of the microcosm, that is, in terms of the specific perceptual and rational characteristics of human beings.  There is no alternative access to them.

Lotze’s philosophical work was guided by his double qualification in medicine and philosophy. While he chose academic philosophy as his profession, his medical training was an ever-present influence on his philosophical thought, in two respects. First, his overall philosophy was characterized by a concern for scientific exactness; he criticized any philosophical doctrine that discards the results of science. Second, he devoted many academic years to (more or less philosophical) studies in medicine and physiology. His efforts in this direction resulted in foundational works in psychology, in virtue of which there is reason to count him among psychology’s founding fathers.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. Biography
    2. Influences and Impacts
    3. Works
  2. Philosophical Principles and Methods
    1. Rigorous, Piecemeal Philosophy
    2. The Principle of Teleomechanism
    3. Regressive Analysis
    4. Anthropology as Prima Philosophia
    5. Methods: Eclecticism and Dialectics
  3. Theoretical Philosophy
    1. Ethics
    2. Ontology and Metaphysics
    3. Epistemology
    4. Logic
    5. Philosophy of Mind
    6. Philosophy of Nature
    7. Philosophy of Language
  4. Philosophy and Life
    1. Anthropology
    2. Social Philosophy
    3. Philosophy of History
    4. Political Philosophy
    5. Philosophy of Religion
    6. Religious Practice
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Bibliographies
    4. Biographies
    5. Further Reading

1. Life and Works

a. Biography

Rudolf Hermann Lotze was born in Bautzen (Saxony) on May 21, 1817, the third child of a military medical doctor. Two years later the family moved to nearby Zittau.

Lotze’s father died in 1827, when Hermann was 12. Soon thereafter, the family got into serious financial troubles.  This series of events shaped Lotze’s character in significant ways. He was independent, ambitious, serious and thrifty, but also melancholic, reserved, even shy.

Between 1828 and 1834 Hermann attended the local High School (Gymnasium). In 1834 he registered at the University of Leipzig.  He wanted to study philosophy—a wish nourished by his love of art and poetry—and he did. However, his experience with financial hardship urged him to simultaneously pursue a degree in the more practical and lucrative field of medicine. Four years later, in 1838, he received doctorates in both disciplines.

After practicing medicine for a year in Zittau, Lotze joined the University of Leipzig as an adjunct lecturer in the Department of Medicine in 1839, and in the Department of Philosophy in 1840. In 1840 Lotze achieved dual degrees, based on post-doctoral dissertations (Habilitation), in medicine and philosophy. As a result, he received a license to teach (venia legendi) at German universities in these two fields.

In 1839, Lotze became engaged to Ferdinande Hoffmann of Zittau (b. 1819), and they were married in 1844.  The marriage produced four sons.  Lotze was deeply attached to his wife, and her death in 1875 was a loss from which he never recovered. One of his numerous British students, Richard Haldane (who later became Lord Chancellor), described him after his wife’s death as one who “seldom sees people, as he lives a sort of solitary life in the country where his home is, about half a mile from Göttingen, and is looked upon as unsociable” (Kuntz 1971, p. 50).

In the year of his marriage, 1844, Lotze was named Herbart’s successor as Professor of Philosophy at the University of Göttingen. He remained at Göttingen until 1880, when he was named Professor of Philosophy at the University of Berlin. A few months later (on July 1, 1881) he died of a cardiac defect that he had suffered from all his life. He was succeeded in the Berlin Chair by Wilhelm Dilthey.

b. Influences and Impacts

Among Lotze’s teachers were Gustav Theodor Fechner, from whom he learned the importance of quantitative experiment, and Christian Weiße, who helped the young Hermann to see the philosophy of German idealism from its aesthetic perspective. Lotze was especially influenced by Kant, Hegel, Herbart, Schelling and Fries. He was personally introduced to Fries—who at the time was a Professor in Jena—by his friend and Fries’ student Ernst Friedrich Apelt.

Some philosophers believe that Lotze was also influenced by his countryman Leibniz (Leibniz was born and raised in Leipzig, Saxony).  Indeed, there are some common points between these two philosophers. But Lotze himself denied such an influence. A hidden influence (seldom discussed in the literature) came from Schleiermacher—via Trendelenburg—who had insisted against the Kant–Drobisch idea of formal logic that logic must be developed together with metaphysics.

Many British and American philosophers of the 1870s and 1880s admired Lotze. William James considered him “the most exquisite of contemporary minds” (Perry 1935, ii., p. 16). Josiah Royce, James Ward and John Cook Wilson studied under him in Göttingen.  Oxford’s T. H. Green was so enthusiastic about Lotze that in 1880 he began the large project of translating his System of Philosophy. The project was incomplete two years later at the time of Green’s death, but it was continued by a team under the guidance of Bernard Bosanquet. Besides Green and Bosanquet, A. C. Bradley (brother of F. H. Bradley), R. L. Nettleship and J. Cook Wilson took part in the general editing. The translation appeared in 1884. In parallel, James Ward and Henry Sidgwick at Cambridge were instrumental in preparing the translation of Lotze’s Microcosm by Elizabeth Hamilton (daughter of William Hamilton) and E. E. Constance Jones, which was published in 1885.

c. Works

Lotze’s first publications were his “lesser” Metaphysics (1841) and “lesser” Logic (1843), in which he charted his philosophical program. His Habilitation in medicine was published in 1842 under the title Allgemeine Pathologie und Therapie als mechanische Naturwissenschaften.

Over the next ten years, Lotze worked on problems at the intersection of medicine and philosophy, in particular the relation between soul and body. The result of these studies were published in two books: Allgemeine Physiologie des körperlichen Lebens (1851) and Medicinische Psychologie oder Physiologie der Seele (1852). During this period, Lotze also published extensive essays on “Leben. Lebenskraft” (1843), “Instinct” (1844), and “Seele und Seelenleben” (1846). In the late 1840s he published important works on aesthetics: “Über den Begriff der Schönheit” (1845), “Über Bedingungen der Kunstschönheit” (1847), and “Quaestiones Lucretianae” (1852).

Microcosm (published in 3 volumes between 1856 and 1864) marked a new period in Lotze’s philosophical development. In this monumental work, he synthesized his earlier ideas: the logico-metaphysical ideas of 1841–3, his psychological ideas of 1842–52, and his aesthetic ideas of 1845–52. Despite some interpretations to the contrary, the book was not only a popular treatise. It also developed technical logical and metaphysical ideas in a form that was unknown from his earlier work.

Shortly after Lotze finished Microcosm, he started his System of Philosophy which consisted of his “greater” Logic (1874), and “greater” Metaphysic (1879).  A third part of the system, on Ethics, Aesthetics and Religious Philosophy, remained unfinished at the time of his death.  Briefly, the difference between Microcosm and System of Philosophy can be put this way: while Microcosm was something of an encyclopedia of philosophical deliberations on human life, private and public, the System was an encyclopedia of the philosophical disciplines.

Lotze possessed an extraordinary ability for studying languages. Many of his papers were written in French, some of them in Latin (e.g., “Quaestiones lucretianae”), and one in English (“Philosophy in the last forty years”, 1880). Lotze also published a volume of his Poetry (Lotze 1840).

2. Philosophical Principles and Methods


a. Rigorous, Piecemeal Philosophy

It will come as no surprise, given his medical training, that Lotze was a scientifically oriented philosopher.  His credo was that no philosophical theory should contradict scientific results. In his medical writings, and above all in the programmatic Allgemeine Pathologie of 1842, he rejected all forms of vitalism (which claims that organismic life is explained by causes other than biochemical reactions) more radically than anyone before him.

Lotze was not a lonely pioneer in embracing the scientific orientation in philosophy. In this he followed his teacher and friend, the early experimental psychologist Gustav Fechner, as well as Hegel’s contemporaries and rivals, Fries and Herbart.  However, he was unique insofar as he introduced a method for recasting particular problems of German Idealism in a refined, philosophical–logical form that was science-friendly. A typical example in this respect was his approach to studying thinking. Lotze connected thinking to two “logically different” domains, valuing and becoming (see section 3.d, below), and considered each of them to be explored by a special science: logic investigates the validity of thinking, and psychology investigates the development of thinking.

Lotze’s new method disciplined metaphysics and ethics on the one hand, and enriched logic on the other.  In other words, it made  metaphysics and ethics more exact, formal disciplines, while making logic more philosophical.

One of Lotze’s motives for embracing this approach was his desire to eliminate the radical disagreements that traditionally had characterized philosophical theorizing—a main source of philosophy’s developing reputation for being unscientific. Lotze believed that the formal (logical) presentation of philosophical theories eliminates their subjective side—the principal source of philosophical animus—and that, thus purified, even seemingly contradictory systems could be shown consistent with one another (Misch 1912, p. xxii).

Lotze’s commitment to this approach led to radical changes in his philosophical practice. In particular, he started to investigate philosophical problems bit by bit, piecemeal, so that a later discovery of a mistake in his investigation did not made his overall philosophy false. (This practice was later followed by Russell (cf. Russell 1918, p. 85) and became central to analytic philosophy.) Lotze’s piecemeal philosophy was facilitated by the introduction—or in some cases the revival—of many concepts which are still widely discussed today, including: (i) the concept of value in logic (its best known successor was the concept of truth-value); (ii) the context principle; (iii) the idea of concept/judgment as a function; (iv) the metaphors of coloring expressions and of saturated–unsaturated expressions; (v) the objective content of perception or the concept of the given (its best known successor was the concept of sense-data); (vi) the objective content of judgments; and (vii) anti-psychologism in logic.  These concepts proved to be seminal to a certain line of German-language philosophy: in various combinations, they play central roles in the thought of Frege, Brentano, Husserl, and those associated with their schools.

In short, Lotze introduced a several  philosophical–logical problems and theses which could be further investigated independently of his overall system. In this sense he instructed his readers to regard his philosophy as “an open market, where the reader may simply pass by the goods he does not want” (Lotze 1874, p. 4). Among other things, this characteristic of Lotze’s philosophy made him the most “pillaged” philosopher of the nineteenth century (Passmore 1966, p. 51). Many of his theses were embraced without crediting him.

b. The Principle of Teleomechanism

A central principle of Lotze’s philosophy was that all processes and movements—physical, biological, psychological, bodily, social, ethical, cultural—are accomplished in a way that can best be called mechanical. This “Principle of Mechanism” helped Lotze to avoid references to deep, metaphysical causes, such as vitalism in the philosophy of biology. In contrast, he insisted that, when theorizing, we are obliged to look to reality as revealed by experiment. On this point, he was clearly influenced by his education as a medical doctor.

At the same time, however, Lotze believed that there were features of experience—such as life, mind, and purpose (telos)—that could not be explained mechanistically. Lotze took these limitations on mechanistic explanation to indicate—even delineate—a “higher and essential being”, reference to which was necessary in order to make mechanistic explanations fully intelligible.  For instance, Lotze thought that our ideas of forces and natural laws describe but do not explain how things work in nature. To understand this, we must connect them with the realm of the trans-sensual (Übersinnliche, 1856b, p. 306).  Only by making this connection can we understand the processes carried out through these mechanisms.

At first glance, this move to teleology as a necessary explanatory category may seem incompatible with Lotze’s own Principle of Mechanism.  He did not think so, however, and part of Lotze’s achievement was the way in which he sought to show these prima facie contrary categories compatible.

Lotze’s solution was to declare the Principle of Mechanism not a metaphysical principle, but a purely methodological principle belonging mainly to the natural sciences.  That is, the principle does not imply that reality is, at bottom, mechanistic.  Rather, it only prescribes a methodology and a mode of interpretation or description as means to achieving a useful understanding of the processes of our environment.  As purely methodological, Lotze’s “Principle of Mechanism” does not claim to capture the full nature of those processes, nor even to begin to describe their sources.  Nor does it claim to explain—or explain away—life, mind, and purpose.  To the contrary, it is consistent with the view that mechanistic processes are the means by which purposes are realized in the world.

Thus, ultimately, Lotze’s position required seeking both mechanistic descriptions of natural processes and teleological explanations of those processes.  Lotze called this hybrid position, “teleomechanism,” or “teleological idealism.”

In Lotze’s hands, the “Principle of Teleomechanism” (i.e., that ultimate explanations should have the hybrid form described above) shapes logic, metaphysics and science through what he calls idealities (Orth 1986, p. 45)- the fundamental orienting concepts of these fields. Among the idealities are ethical values, logical validities and aesthetic worth. In science and metaphysics, the idealities of spatial and temporal order, the principle of atomicity (cf. section 3.a,e) and the aforementioned relationism (cf. the opening summary at the head of this article), play a central role.

c. Regressive Analysis

The declared objective of Lotze’s philosophy was a “reflection on the meaning of our human being [Dasein]” (1856b, p. 304). The urgency of this task was a consequence of the scientific and industrial revolution of the beginning and the middle of the nineteenth century. That revolution dramatically changed the way in which humans see the cosmos and universe. It eroded the unity of God and humanity; traditional mythology proved inconsistent. As a consequence, the world started to seem alien, cold, immense. A substantial weakening in religious belief followed. Lotze saw danger in the numerous attempts (on the side of the mechanic philosopher-scientists like Georg Büchner, Heinrich Czolbe, Franz Fick, Jacob Moleschott and Karl Vogt) to prove that the microcosm of human beings is merely mechanical, or materialistic. His objective was to disprove such attempts and to make people feel at home in the world again.

Contrary to the trends in then-current anthropology, Lotze did not seek to explain humanity in terms of the technologies it produced. Rather, he thought, the keys for understanding the human race are found in the results of human education and schooling (Bildung), as they have been developed in history. This meant that his philosophical investigations began not simply with the elements of human culture, but with developed human cultures taken as wholes, and indeed the history of such cultures taken as a whole. From these wholes, he then worked “backwards”, analyzing their “parts”, such as logic, metaphysics, science and mathematics. This is the approach of regressive analysis (1874, § 208; 1879, pp. 179 ff.).

Lotze believed that the main educational goods (Bildungsgüter) of human culture are usually conveyed by poetry and religion. They provide a “higher perspective on things,” the “point of view of the heart.” This means that the mechanistic processes upon which science focuses are not the only key to understanding the world; they are not even the most important key. To the contrary, science becomes intelligible and useful for humans only in connection with the historically developed values and forms of schooling and education characteristic of a developed human culture (cf. Lotze’s Principle of Teleomechanism, in section 2.b, above). This point is clearly seen in the fact that we have a priori notions neither of bad and good, nor of blue or sweet(1864, p. 241).

But how exactly can the history of culture command the shape of logic, metaphysics and science? Lotze’s answer in brief is: through the  idealities they produce. As magnitudes identifiable in experience, these idealities serve as orientating concepts for all academic disciplines, giving them direction and purpose within the context of a unified human life in a developed human culture.

Following Kant, Lotze claimed that idealities pertain to mental, not material, reality. However, they require matter in order to be exemplified or articulated by human beings. We understand idealities only in experience. To be more specific, we find them at work above all in our sensual life and in our feelings of pleasure and displeasure. We find them further in ethics, aesthetics, science, mathematics, metaphysics and logic. The spatial order, for example, is such an ideality: it is revealed via the matrix of discrete material entities in their dimensional magnitude and in the spaces between them, but it is not given as another thing among things. Rather, it is mentally “noticed” as a necessary “backdrop” to, a “condition of the possibility of”, the matrix of material things. (This conception was adopted by Bertrand Russell in his Essays on the Foundations of Geometry; cf. Milkov 2008)

Given his views on the relation of the material to the ideal, Lotze was convinced that the quarrel between materialism and idealism was misguided. . It was a quarrel about meaning: Idealists see too much meaning (borne by ideal entities) in reality, while materialists see no meaning in it at all.  Fearing that the characteristically vague aesthetic elements of human experience would undermine exact science, the materialists attempted to extract  all humanistic meaning from reality by sanctioning only mathematical descriptions of mechanically-construed natural processes (the likes of which we see in scientific formulae, such as F=MA in physics).  But Lotze thought such fears were in vain.  Just as mechanism was compatible with teleology, so Lotze thought that aesthetics (poetry) and religion (revealed truth) were compatible with the mathematics and calculation preferred by the materialists. By the same token, the acceptance of mechanism as a purely methodological principle in science did not invalidate the belief in free will.  On the contrary: since mechanism made the spiritual effort to achieve the trans-sensual more strenuous, it only “increased the poetical appeal of the world”(1856b, p. 306).

d. Anthropology as Prima Philosophia

Lotze’s main objective was the investigation of the concrete human being with her imaginings, dreams and feelings. He considered these elements—as expressed in poetry and art—as constitutive of a human person and her life. This explains the central role that the concept of home (Heimat) plays in his metaphysics. The related concept in his philosophy of mind is feeling and heart (Gemüt), as different from mind (Geist) and soul (Seele). Indeed, Lotze introduced the concept of heart in the wake of German mysticism (e.g., Meister Eckhart); however, he used it in a quite realistic sense. Heart is what makes us long for home. The longing itself is a result of our desires which we strive to satisfy. Life consists, above all, in consuming (geniesen) goods, material and ideal. This conception of human life is, of course, close to hedonism. (cf. section 3.a)

Lotze did not introduce anthropological investigation in philosophy. Rather, it was started in the sixteenth century, in an effort to renovate theology. During the next three centuries, anthropology became a favorite subject among German university philosophers—including Kant. In his anthropology, however, Lotze did not follow Kant. Kant distinguished between theoretical philosophy and mundane philosophy, with anthropology following in the latter category.  But Lotze abolished Kant’s distinction between the theoretical and mundane (1841a, p. 17), and he developed his “theoretical anthropology” exactly in order to merge the two philosophical disciplines into one.

The conclusion Lotze made was that Kant’s question “what can I know?” cannot be answered in the abstract; it can be only answered in terms of embodied persons in concrete socio-historical situations. Only when we embrace this perspective, Lotze thought, can we also grasp the depth and the importance of metaphysical problems.

This point brings us to the most important characteristic of Lotze’s philosophy. Lotze did not simply shift from metaphysics to anthropology. Rather, his anthropology became philosophy proper (Orth 1986, p. 43).

e. Methods: Eclecticism and Dialectics

From the very beginning of his career, Lotze’s subscribed to the view that, “When we cannot necessarily join one of the dominating parties, we [shall …] stay in the middle via free eclecticism” (Lotze 1843, p. 1). Today the word “eclecticism” is used mainly in a pejorative sense, but this was not true for Lotze. To the contrary, he thought eclecticism a most useful method in philosophy, and in 1840 even lauded it in a poem entitled “Eclecticism” (Kroneberg 1899, p. 218).

Lotze’s eclecticism was characterized by his logical turn in metaphysics. Indeed, as seen in section 2.a, the latter made his philosophy a rigorous science, enabling him to compress many of the problems of generations of philosophers into a unified theory. This point explains the astonishing success with which Lotze employed his eclecticism. It enabled him to look past the differences of philosophers like Kant, J. G. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel, and to focus on what he took to be the most valuable ideas common to them.  Distilling their thought, he frequently reformulated their views in logically exact expressions.

Consistent with his eclecticism, Lotze also used something approaching Hegel’s dialectical method (Lotze, 1841a, p. 320). This is why “there are some passages [in Lotze’s writings] in which he does seem conscious of the contradictions and [nevertheless] attempts to mediate between the two,” rather than eliminating one of them. (Kuntz 1971, p. 34).

Some authors have a negative view of these Hegelian tendencies in Lotze. For example, Eduard von Hartmann complains that “there is scarcely a ‘yes’ by Lotze, which is not undermined at another place by a ‘no’” (Hartmann 1888, p. 147). Yet other philosophers, like George Santayana, have recognized that, despite the apparent contradictions, Lotze’s system remained very consistent overall.  Careful attention reveals that most of the supposed contradictions are apparent only, and result from the failure to note the varying perspectives from which Lotze conducted his philosophical research.

For instance, as discussed in section 2.b., Lotze insisted that mechanistic descriptions were appropriate and indeed required in science, but inappropriate in metaphysics, where teleological explanations are required.  It is easy to see this double-demand for mechanism and teleology as contradictory, so long as one fails to recognize that each demand is a “methodological” demand only, made by the requirements of two disciplines with differing norms and purposes.  Similarly, the idealistic tendencies of his system were part of a psychological description of reality, “a personal manner of reading things, a poetic intuition of the cosmic life” (Santayana 1889, 155).  Other aspects of his system—like his atomism—were radically objectivistic, suited only to the demands of scientific description and scientific work.

Lotze’s perspectivalism—his tendency to treat some views as “merely methodological” from within a given disciplinary perspective—can make him difficult to follow.  The problem is compounded by his tendency to, on occasion, switch perspectives in the course of a single work.  For instance, he begins his ontological investigations with pluralistic realism only to end it with monistic idealism. As a result, Lotze’s views are frequently difficult to state, and also difficult to criticize.

Lotze also introduced a specific method of discussing different views (Ansichten) on the subject under scrutiny. He was against the hasty satisfaction of our theoretical needs and expectations through one-sided theories. Furthermore, Lotze claimed that his final solutions were merely views which satisfy “needs of the heart”. Incidentally, this point can be comfortably interpreted in the sense of FreudWittgenstein: philosophical puzzles are similar to mental neuroses, which can be treated by changing the perspective.

3. Theoretical Philosophy


a. Ethics

Lotze’s ethics were influenced by J.F. Herbart, who preceded Lotze as the Philosophy Chair in Gottingen.  The starting point of philosophical exploration for J.F. Hebart begins with the analysis of the objects immediately given in inner and outer experience. (Pester 1997, p. 119). Being was for Herbart real—beyond and independent from the world of ideas. From here followed a strict division between theoretical and practical philosophy—reality and values, being and obligation, are independent one from another.

Lotze agreed with Herbart that we cannot draw conclusions about value from facts about reality, but he insisted that we can do the reverse; that is, we can draw conclusions about reality from facts about values. He expressed this belief in the claim that both logic and metaphysics are ultimately based on ethics. Lotze already declared this idea in his first philosophical work, his lesser Metaphysics, where he claimed that “the beginning of metaphysics lies not in itself but in ethics” (1841a, p. 329). Two years later he postulated that “the logical forms cannot be independent from metaphysical presupposition, and they also cannot be totally detached from the realm of morality” (1843, p. 7).

Of course, ethics is not presented in metaphysics in propositional form. Rather, ethics enters metaphysics in judgments about which possibilities for ordering facts correspond to an ideally presupposed order or to Lotze’s idealities (see section 2.c, above). In this sense, there is no knowledge without ethical presuppositions.


Lotze’s idealities found expression above all in the concept of value. More especially, Lotze claimed that “values are the key for the world of forms” (1857, p. 22). This position explains why in the literature, he is widely considered to be the philosopher who introduced the concept of “values” in philosophy.

Lotze was adamant that the measure of values is only the “satisfaction of the sentimental needs [Gemütsbedürfnisse]” (1852, p. 242). The most natural of these satisfactions is pleasure. This means that moral principles are to be founded on the principle of delight (Lustprincip). This is an  empirical solution to  the problems of ethics which is clearly related to Epicurean hedonism.

This position explains why Lotze avoided Kant’s formalism of the categorical imperative. Instead, following Fries, he accepted a psychological basis of the maxims of ethics, claiming that we draw our moral principles from the immediate certainty with which we consider something as true or good (1858, p. 287).

The point which unites the subjectivism of this position with Lotze’s idiosyncratic objectivism (cf. the summary) is that, despite assuming values to be recognized via delight, he does not limit them to persons only. Rather, Lotze understands values—by way of being idealities—also as crucial for apprehension of physical facts: they constitute the “meaning of the world in general—as a universal method for speculative expansion of all appearances” (Misch 1912, p. lxv).

b. Ontology and Metaphysics

According to Lotze’s metaphysics, the world consists of substances in relation, and so of substances and relations.  Let's examine these categories, beginning with substances.

In the Aristotelian tradition, only wholes exhibiting an organic unity, such as a particular human being or a particular horse, can count as substances—arbitrary collections of things, like a heap of sand or the random assortment of items in a person’s pocket, do not count.

Lotze does not embrace either of these two conceptions of substance. Instead, he defends a constructivist position which assumes that substance is a whole composed of parts that hang together in a particular relation of dependence. More especially, the elements of the substance (the whole) stand to one another in a relation in which the elements effect each other reciprocally, binding each other together into the whole that they constitute.

In order to specify this kind of relation, Lotze borrowed from Ammonius (28,1,14) the term effectus transeunt (“action in passing”, or “cursory action”).  Effectus transeunt is the minimal effect that elements A and B exercise on each other in the substance M, in virtue of which they stay in M. Through effectus transeunt, the otherwise independent elements of the substance became interdependent. To put this in other words, effectus transeunt produces the “ontological glue” that binds elements into organic wholes.

Formally, we can describe the construction of a substance this way. The elements of a substance (a whole) stand to one another in a reciprocal relation and in a unique order (Folge)(Lotze 1879, § 69). Furthermore, if we call the whole (the substance) M, and its elements A, B, and R (A and B are particular elements which are in the focus of our attention, and R designates the sum of all unspecified elements which can occur in the whole), we can denote the whole with the formula M=φ[A B R], where φ stands for the connection between the elements. The type of connection is a resultant of the specific relations and positions of the elements of the substance, as well as of their order in it (§ 70). In fact, this is the structure of the minimal composite unity.

In general, relations play a central role in Lotze’s ontology. One of his slogans was: “It belongs to the notion and nature of existing [object] to be related” (Lotze 1885, ii. p. 587). Lotze was interested in what Bertrand Russell has later called “internal” relations, or relations between the elements in the substances. The substances themselves stay in “external” relations to one another.

The external relations are of various kinds, each of which has its idiosyncratic type of coordinate. For example, the system of geometrical relations and the system of colors are two networks of relations essential to the material world, but not to the world of art, or to the spiritual world of men. There are also other kinds of relation-networks (see Lotze 1856a, pp. 461–2; Lotze 1885 ii. p. 575). For instance, from the perspective of the subject, Lotze’s universe has at least two further relation-networks:

  1. that of perception; this network is the universe of what he calls “local-signs” (see section 3.e);
  2. that of judgments and concepts; this network is the universe of states of affairs. (see section 3.d)

In metaphysics proper, Lotze transformed the Hegelian dichotomy between being and becoming to the trichotomy being, becoming, value. The given is; it is opposed to both what happens (e.g. changes) and to the validities. The transition between these three is impossible.

From the perspective of his conception of values, Lotze also suggested a new interpretation of Plato’s theory of ideas. Ideas have two characteristics: (i) they have their own autonomous being; (ii) in the same time, ideas have properties, similar to those of the objects of reality. Lotze’s claim was that these two conditions are only fulfilled by values. In fact, Plato’s ideas are validities of truths. Plato misrepresented them as “ideas” only because in Greek there is no expression for things which have no being: and values are just such things (1874, § 317). The fact that Plato’s ideas are validities, Lotze argues further, explains why they are beyond space and time, beyond things and minds, remaining at that atomistic. Lotze’s interpretation of Plato’s ideas was further developed by Paul Natorp (Natorp 1902).

c. Epistemology

Lotze’s task in epistemology was to secure knowledge which is to be extracted, and separated, from perception. The main characteristic of knowledge is that it is true. To Lotze, this means that it, and only it, presents the things as they really are—and, in fact, that is what is expected from thinking as a result.

The difference between perception and knowledge (or thinking; in identifying thinking and knowledge Lotze was followed by Frege) can be set out in the following way.  Perception (including imagining, daydreaming, etc.) notes accidental relations of ideas, but knowledge asserts a natural fit (a “necessary connection”) among these ideas: they belong together (zusammengehören).  In other words, the perceiving mind conceives “kaleidoscopically” a multiplicity of contingent pictures (Bilder) (1843, p. 72). Only then comes thinking, which consists in going through the ideas a second time, producing in this way “secondary thoughts” (Nebengedanken). The latter connect only those ideas which intrinsicallybelong together.

Lotze describes his “secondary thoughts” as constituting “a critical stand towards an idea.” This conception assumes that we have a kind of intuition that helps us to judge is the connection of ideas that lie before us—in our perception—true, or false.

Some authors have claimed that this idea is a further transformation of Hegel’s method of dialectical self-development of the truth (Misch 1912, p. xxvii). But it would be more correct to say that Lotze’s secondary thoughts are an incorporation into logic of the old Platonic–Aristotelian idea of peirastic (tentative, experimental) inquiry that tests different opinions and decides which connection of ideas they make is true and which false. (This interpretation was supported by Lotze’s pupils, Julius Bergmann and Wilhelm Windelband.) Indeed, Lotze is adamant that “this inner regularity of the content sought-after, being unknown yet, is not open to us in specific realistic definitions of thought. However, being present in the form of opinion, it really has [...] the defensive [intuitive] force to negotiate what is not suitable to her” (Lotze 1841a, p. 33).

d. Logic

The concept of the judgment and its content (Urteilsinhalt) played a central role in Lotze’s logic.  He claimed that the content of judgment is not an interrelation of ideas, as Hume and Mill believed, but an interrelation of objective contents, or things: it is a state of affairs (a concept introduced by Lotze and later also used by Husserl and Wittgenstein—cf. Milkov 2002). Since there is no difference between the content of judgments and reality, the state of affairs has the structure of the substance or of the minimal composite unity. This position was another expression of Lotze’s objectivism (see the summary).

But the content of judgment has also two other dimensions which have little to do with its structural characteristics:

First, the content of the judgment is asserted by the judgment.  Thus, the judgment has w an assertoric quality, and what Lotze calls its affirmation (Bejahung), or “positing” (Setzung).  In somewhat different sense, this idea was further developed by Hans Reichenbach. For Lotze, this is the ultimate quality of a judgment—it is what makes a judgment a judgment, as opposed to complex of terms. Later, this conception was also adopted by Frege who assumed that the judgment acknowledges the truth of its content so that only this acknowledgement makes the combination of ideas a judgment. In other words, the judgment is an acceptance, or assumption of content as true, or rejecting it as false.

This characteristic of judgment was connected with a variant of the context principle, according to which a word has a meaning not in isolation but in the context of a proposition in which it occurs: “The affirmation of a single notion has no meaning which we can specify; we can affirm nothing but a judgment in which the content of one notion is brought into relation with that of another” (Lotze 1864, p. 465; Lotze 1885 ii. p. 582).Frege followed Lotze also on this point.

Second, the content of judgment has a value: this is a point that connects Lotze’s logic with his ethics(cf. section 2.c, above). To be more specific, Lotze claimed that concepts have meaning (Bedeutung), but not value. They can have a value only through the proposition in which they occur—in its context (Lotze 1874, § 321). In 1882 Lotze’s closest pupil, Wilhelm Windelband, introduced the concept of truth-value in the wake of this idea. Nine years later, this concept was also embraced by Frege in his “Function and Concept.”

Following Herbart, and developing further the idea of content of judgment, Lotze also explored the idea of the “given” (Gegebene) in philosophy.  More especially, Lotze understood the given as an “experienced content of perception” that was different from the content of judgment, or the state of affairs. Later this conception of the given was instrumental by coining the concept of sense-data (see Milkov 2001).

e. Philosophy of Mind

As was shown in the explanation  of the principle of teleomechanism (section 2.b), Lotze was adamant that the way in which phenomena are explained in physics is not appropriate for the mental or psychical world.  For instance, mechanical descriptions do not explain why we experience the effects of light-waves as color, or of sound-waves as tones. In this regard, Lotze criticized Herbart’s view that the interaction of ideas in a person’s mind (such as how ideas compete to capture a person’s attention or compel belief) is to be explained on analogy with the physical conception of force.  On Lotze’s view, the content of ideas is more important than their intensity(1856a, pp. 238 ff.).

Concerning the relation between soul and body, the so-called “mind-body problem,” Lotze did not offer a positive theory—in fact, he denies that we can understand this relation—but adopted a version of occasionalism.  Occasionalism is the view that events in the mental realm are synchronized with events in the material realm in such a way that it seems that the two realms are interacting, even though they do not in fact interact.  To adopt this as a methodological stance was Lotze’s way of saying that, even though the two realms may interact, we do not need to understand how they do in order to have a perfectly good, practical theory about the relation between mind and body  (1852, pp. 77 f.).

To the extent that Lotze develops a solution to the “mind-body problem,” he does so by introducing his famous conception of local-signs (Localzeichen), which explains the relation between mind and matter in terms of our perception of space and movement. According to Lotze, what we directly see when perceiving a movement are only patches of color. What helps us to perceive the fact of movement is the effort that we ourselves make in perceiving the movement. Lotze calls this stimulus a “local-sign.” It is a means of transforming sense-perceptions into space-values.

This means that our knowledge of the connection of mind to matter is not a fruit of reflection but of activity (in this assumption Lotze followed J. G. Fichte); it is not simply a matter of grasping. Indeed, the process of space-perceiving is an activity of reconstruction of the external objects, and events, in consciousness (1856a, pp. 328 f.). This conception was another critique of  the purely mechanical understanding in philosophy.

Lotze’s theory of logical signs was further developed by Hermann von Helmholtz in the conception that sense-organs do not supply isomorphic pictures of the outer world, but only signals which perception transforms further into pictures. Helmholtz’s theory, in turn, was later embraced by the logical empiricists Moritz Schlick and Hans Reichenbach.

Lotze further claimed that thoughts are tools (organa) for deciphering messages of reality. This deciphering takes place in realizing of values. The aim of human thought is not to serve as a lens for immediate grasping reality, but to be valid. This means that the structure of thoughts has scarcely anything to do with the structure of the facts. Nevertheless, their effects coincide (1874, § 342). Thus, despite the fact that there are no general ideas in reality, we understand reality  only through  general ideas.

Lotze did not believe that this conception leads to epistemological pessimism. It is true that “reality may be more extensive than our capacities for representing it (whether by knowledge, feeling, etc.)” can assimilate (Cuming 1917, p. 163). Lotze insisted, however, that these features of reality are beyond the interests of philosophers, since beyond their (human) reach (in essence, along the lines of the saying: “what the eye does not see, the heart does not grieve over”).

f. Philosophy of Nature

As a young man Lotze was befriended with Ernst Friedrich Apelt, a pupil of Fries. (cf. section 1.b) Through Apelt, Lotze became familiar with Friesian philosophy, which he later used as a convenient foil in the development of some of his own views. Fries’ philosophy followed Kant formally, but in fact was more mechanical and calculative than Kant’s. In truth, it was even more mechanical and calculative than the philosophy of Herbart, who himself was a well-known mechanistic Kantian.

Lotze criticized Fries for being too formal and forgetting the “deep problems” of philosophy. Specifically, Lotze attacked Fries’ (and arguably Kant’s) dynamic understanding of matter, which represents it as simply the interplay of powers. Thus construed, the standard, empirical properties of matter (such as extension, solidity, place, and so on) disappear. Against this conception, Lotze embraced a form of atomism, which he saw as necessary for the individuation of material objects. Indeed, humans understand something only when the content of their judgment is articulated, and there cannot be an articulation without individuation; furthermore, individuation is best carried out when we accept that there are atoms. Besides, Lotze was convinced that the order in the world cannot come into being from a purposeless and planless beginning—from what today is called an “atomless gunk.” The point is that the order  presupposes an articulation and individuation: it is order between individuals—between Lotze’s variables A, B, and R (cf. section 3.b).

Apparently, Lotze did not understand atoms as they were understood in antiquity: as ultimate elements of reality which have different forms, but the same substance .  He did conceive of them as the ultimate building blocks of the material world, but he saw them as idiosyncratic and as remaining unmodified in all compositions and divisions. In other words, whereas the ancient atomism saw each atom as made out of the same kind of substance , Lotze saw each atom as being made of a unique kind of substance , so that each atom is sui generis.

Further difference with the atomism of the antiquity was that Lotze’s atoms were punctual (i.e., point-like), without extension (unräumlich).  Indeed, extension is possible only where there are many points which can be easily identified and differentiated. The extensionless atoms find their mutual place in space through their powers. To be more specific, we conceive of them as impermeable, filling up the space, only because of their demonstrated reciprocal resistance (1856a, p. 402).

An important characteristic of matter is its passivity, i.e. its ability to be affected from the outside. True to his anthropological stance, Lotze accepted that only if two essences mutually produce their respective “sufferings” (Leiden) can they be their respective interacting causes. (1864, p. 574) (The concept of “suffering” shows influence on Lotze of his countryman Jacob Böhme – both were born in Upper Lusatia, Saxony.) At the same time, Lotze was adamant that the concepts of suffering, effecting, and interaction are only—although inescapable—scientific metaphors. We must not conceive of them literally. However, they help us to grasp the nature of the problem.

In questions of space, Lotze used his teacher Weiße, rather than Fries, as a foil. Weiße had distinguished between space and interaction (Wechselwirkung) of substance. Moreover, for Weiße, interaction is the condition of space. (2003, pp. 85 f.) In contrast, Lotze differentiated, not between interaction and space (he was convinced that the two coincide), but between extension and place. “Extension” refers to an infinite multiplicity of directions. Only place, however, makes these possibilities concrete, putting them into three coordinated directions (Pester 1997, p. 110).

g. Philosophy of Language

Starting with his lesser Logic, Lotze made great efforts to elaborate a convincing philosophy of language. His first step in this direction was to connect language with logic by claiming that logic begins with exploring language forms (1843, p. 40). The reason for this assumption was that the living, unconscious “spirit of [ordinary] language” makes a connection between what one experiences concretely in sense perception, and the abstract forms that one extracts from sense perception (p. 82).  (This idea was also adopted—via Frege—in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, 3.1: “In a proposition a thought finds expression that can be perceived by the senses.”) Indeed, our language functions on the level of perceptions. This, however, is not a hindrance to our using it to convey truths of a higher order: truths of science, mathematics, logic, etc (1856a, p. 304).

Lotze criticized the idea—later made famous by Wittgenstein—that language has meaning by picturing reality. According to Lotze, not even the pictures formed by perceiving are pictures proper (cf. section 3.e, above)—much less, therefore, pictures supposedly embedded in the structures of language.  Rather than performing a picturing function, language provides something of a method.  To be more specific, it provides rules for transforming signals from the sensual world into the phenomena of our mental world, and vice-versa: from our perception into the meanings we formulate and communicate with the help of the language.  In fact, the whole relation between microcosm and macrocosm was understood by Lotze in this way. The microcosm can be characterized as a “language of the macrocosm”, and at the same time, a place for understanding the possibilities of speaking about the macrocosm (Orth 1986, p. 48).

4. Philosophy and Life


a. Anthropology

Lotze was adamant that we cannot prefer logical forms over facts, as Hegel had once done. In particular, he criticized Hegel’s ladder-model of natural history, which claimed that we can deduce the value and importance of every particular species from its place on the ladder of evolution. Instead of formal (logical) rankings of living species, Lotze promoted a comparison of their natural figures (Gestalten). (From this perspective he also criticized Darwin’s evolution theory.) The difference between the mind of animals and that of man arises not because of a difference in the elements which they contain; in fact, here and there the same building blocks, or “mosaic-stones” (Mosaikstifte), enter into the scene. (This point was recently confirm Rather, that variation results from the way in which they are combined and used (1858, p. 266).

Lotze also criticized the intellectualism of the German Idealists. Instead, he sided with the German Enlightenment’s tendency to emphasize the importance of sensuality, of feelings and imagination (Phantasie). In this key, he classified animals not according to their capacity to think (as Herder did), but according to their physical performance and forms of consumption (genießen). On this point he was criticized by many of his contemporaries, including his friends, the “speculative theists” I. H. Fichte and C. H. Weiße. These two found in the Microcosm too little idealism and too much realism (Weiße 1865, pp. 289 ff.).

This reproach was scarcely justified; for Lotze endorsed the essential difference between the human mind and that of other animals.  The difference was that all human thought has reference to, or is at least formed from within, traditions: in language, science, skills, morals, as well as in practical habits and in judgments of everyday life (1858, p. 262). Moreover, Lotze claimed that “to know man means, above all, to know his vocation [Bestimmung], the means which he has in disposition to achieve it, as well as the hindrances that he must overcome in this effort” (p. 72). In this kind of anthropology, the ability to use the arm, and later also instruments was most important.

b. Social Philosophy

Lotze treated every epoch of human culture as developed around a particular value: (i) the Orient developed a taste for the colossal, (ii) the Jews for the elevated, (iii) the Greeks for the beautiful, (iv) the Romans for dignity and elegance, (v) the Middle Ages for the fantastic and emblematic, and (vi) Modernity for the critical and inventive. These orientations and achievements are on a par with one another (1864, pp. 124 ff.). The acceptance of the plurality of values was unique in German philosophy at the time: for instance, whereas we can easily find anti-Semitic judgments from Herder and Kant, not so from Lotze.

According to Lotze, achieving social progress is not a matter of quantitative growth but of reaching a “systematic complete harmony” in this or that particular culture. This state could be attained, for example, if the rules of social conduct are conceived of as a system of rights and duties of an objective spiritual (geistiges) organism (p. 424). Such a society could be considered a work of Nature, “or rather not simply of Nature, but of the Moral World Order [sittliche Weltordnung] which is independent of the individual” (p. 443).

Lotze was not convinced that the scientific and technological progress of the human race through the first half of the nineteenth century had increased its humaneness.  For, the increase in humanity’s power over nature was accompanied by a proportional increase in our dependence upon it.  The new ways of life afforded by developing technologies created new consumption needs, but many of these new needs were superfluous—not needs at all, but only desires—and some of them could be positively harmful.  (Think, by way of comparison, of the relation between the various culinary technologies that in the last decades made fast-food possible, the growth of desires/felt-need for fast-food, and the negative effects of fast-food upon public health).  Thus it is not unreasonable to think that we might have been better-off without the technologies that, although they enabled humanity to solve certain practical problems, created others that were previously unknown.

However, such felt-needs/desires cannot be eliminated through mere insight into truth, e.g., by recognizing that they are superfluous and harmful. The disapproving stance on this matter, taken by Diogenes of Sinope or Rousseau, is attractive and plausible mainly as a critique. Indeed, the natural state, which they propagated, can be seen as a state of innocence, but also as one of barbarism.

As a solution to this problem Lotze accepted that there is a constant human way of life which repeats itself practically unchanged: its purposes, motives and habits have the same form. This is the course of the world (der Weltlauf), an ever-green stalk from which the colorful blossoms of history cyclically emerge. In fact, the true goods of our inner life increase either only slowly, or perhaps they do not increase at all (1858, p. 345).

Perhaps the most interesting development of our modern time is the introduction of division of work and the new (Protestant) phenomenon of “profession.” (This idea was further developed by Max Weber.) An important effect of this process is that life is now divided into work and leisure (1864, p. 281; pp. 245–7).

Every profession stimulates the heart to embody a specific direction of imagination, a perspective on the world, and a way of judging. This state of affairs produced different forms of existence (Existenzarten) which makes modernity one of the most interesting epochs of human history. The main disadvantage of the professional life, Lotze says, is its monotony (1858, pp. 437–8).

c. Philosophy of History

The history of human society is a central subject of Lotze’s Microcosm.  Lotze’s views on this topic are best presented in contrast with what was then the standard or “mainstream” approach to history, which he faulted for lacking realism, and therefore for failing to generate genuine historical knowledge.

Mainstream history was inspired by two chief sources: Hegelianism, and what may loosely be described as positivism.  Although radically different in their guiding assumptions, these two movements overlapped in their consequences for history.

Hegel believed that history is produced by the movements of an arcane entity called “the world-spirit” (Weltgeist) and of its interaction with humanity.  Specifically, Hegel believed that the Weltgeist’s goal was to bring the human race into the full realization of the idea of humanity, i.e., into an ideal state of being.  To this end, it leads certain humans—by means of which they are unaware—to advance the race in various ways.  These humans (heroes) turn out to be the great figures in history, and their movements and achievements, as Hegel saw it, constitute history.  That is, history consists not of everything that happens, but above all of great movements that advance humanity significantly toward its ideal, of those events that constitute a substantial realization of the ideal.

In short, the Hegelian approach requires commitment to an inevitably contentious idealization of humanity, an assumption about what counts as the highest realization of human nature.  Lotze claimed that such theories have their place in Philosophy, but they can only skew our perceptions when allowed to control our search for fundamental data in History.  In Hegel’s case, for instance, his ideal of humanity led him to neglect both the contributions of women to history (1864, pp. 47 ff.; in this regard Lotze appears as a precursor of the modern feminism), and the role played by the mundane aspects of individuals’ lives—which of course constitutes the lager part of human history.  (This claim of Lotze shows him as a predecessor of the nouvelle histoire school of Marc Bloch which accentuated discussions in history of past facts of la vie quotidienne.)

The positivist approach to history, exemplified by Leopold von Ranke and Johann Gustav Droysen, had similar consequences.  Focusing too much on “objective” facts and formal considerations, and too little on the concrete, embodied, and emotional aspects of human life, historically significant but “ordinary” elements of human life were eliminated from consideration.

Lotze rejected both the idealism of Hegel and the demand for “objective faciticity” that came from the positivists.  Against Hegel, Lotze argued that human progress does not proceed  linearly nor ladder-wise:  many achievements of human society disappear without a trace, while others disappear for a time, only to be reintroduced by new generations. Rather, Lotze saw humanity developing in a spiral pattern, in which moments of progress are offset by moments of regress.  To be sure, this perspective appears rather gloomy alongside the mainstream approach, but it is clearly more realistic, and better suited to teaching humanity about itself.

Lotze agreed with Lessing’s thesis that the purpose of history is the education of humanity. (This point coheres with Lotze’s claim, discussed in section 2.b–c above, that we can understand philosophy and science starting from the history of human education and schooling.) That assumption helps to draw a more realistic picture of human progress than what Hegelian and positivist history provided.  Seeing history as a didactic tool, Lotze’s desiderata for good historical work were shaped by his ideals for education.  In particular, they were modeled by his conviction that the purpose of human spiritual life consists in the richness of an education capable of harmonizing all the aspects of a concrete, embodied person’s life.  This is what drove Lotze to reject the positivists’ “objective facticity” as inadequate for history.

Lotze’s alternative was an aesthetic, or poetic, approach to history. (1864, p. 46)   As he saw it, poetry and history are both creative, setting up new life-worlds.   The task of the historian was to present concepts as they were understood in their original contexts, exactly as they were embraced, felt, and consumed in the past—not anachronistically, as they might be understood in the present, through the “lens” of a different form of life.  This task required both the focus on empirical fact characteristic of positivist history, but also an element of poetic imagination—for only the latter could add flesh to the dry bones of empirical fact.  By combining both modes of cognition, the historian was to determine how the concept fitted into the total form of life characteristic of the period in which it originated, as well as those that inherited the concept—in effect, to re-create the life-world of the people whose concept it was. This line of thought was later developed by R. G. Collingwood.

d. Political Philosophy

Lotze’s political philosophy discussed such themes as social rationalization, power, bureaucracy, national values, sovereignty, and international relations. Above all, he defended the enlightened, hereditary monarchy. He saw it as offering “the greatest security for steady development”—and, as he saw it, this is of greatest value in political life. (p. 444) Further, being a philosopher of the concrete, full-blooded man, with his feelings and imagination, Lotze defended paternal patriotism; he preferred the love for the concrete fatherland over the love for the state with its institutions. In particular, Lotze criticized the view (defended by his contemporary Jacob Burckhardt) that the State should exist for its own sake. He also distrusted parliamentary representation and party politics.

Lotze repudiated Plato’s model of the state as an analog of the human person, and accepted instead a model of political equilibrium construed as “the result of the reciprocal action of unequal forces” (p. 423).  In matters of international law, he was an advocate of a balance of power of sovereign states. He believed that “the increasing relations between the different divisions of humankind changed in great measure the significance of the political boundaries and gave new stimulus to the idea of cosmopolitanism” (p. 436).

Lotze disparaged those critics of modernity who claimed that its proponents only defend their desire for material well-being. Moreover, although he did not use the term “liberalism,” Lotze adhered to the principles of what we would now call “classical bourgeois liberalism;” but he criticized “Manchester liberalism” (cf. the “turbo-capitalism” of the “roaring 1990s”) that followed ideas of such philosophers as Thomas Malthus, referring, among other things, to what today is called “the paradox of liberalism:” liberalism fails to show how an isolated human being can be a subject of rights. Indeed, right is a reciprocal, and so collective, concept: “one’s right is what the others feel for us as a duty” (p. 427).

Lotze criticized the concept of natural law employed by the mainstream Western philosophers like Aristotle and Hobbes who claim that law is set by nature. Instead, Lotze had sympathies with the historicist conception of law developed by Leopold von Ranke and Friedrich von Savigny who defended the thesis that the notions of law are coined in human practice. Lotze used to say that “the beginning of all legitimacy is illegitimate, although it need not be at the same time illegal” (p. 417).

e. Philosophy of Religion

The religion of the modern man was for Lotze a feeling of life (Lebensgefühl) in which the awareness of the fragility of the human race is connected with a sense of conscience about a lay profession. (The latter point was extensively discussed by Max Weber.) Men know how modest their life-tasks are and nevertheless are happy to pursue them. This is a belief which follows the consciousness and the inner voice, and which, nevertheless, is exactly as certain as the knowledge we receive through the senses (1858, pp. 447 f.).

Lotze criticizes the Enlightenment claim that religion is only a product of human reason. If that was true, then it would be possible to replace religion with philosophy. However, for Lotze, reason alone is not enough to grasp religious truth: we learn it through revelation which can be thought of as the historical action of God (1864, p. 546). Lotze also criticizes Fries who compared religion, which starts from unproven truths, to science which is also ultimately based on unproved axioms we believe. Rather, whereas the axioms of science are general and hypothetical judgments, the propositions of religion are apodictic.

A leading idea of Lotze’s philosophy of religion was that “all the processes in nature are understandable only through the continuing involvement of God; only this involvement arranges the passing of the interaction [Übergang des Wechselwirkungs] between different parts of the world” (p. 364). This claim can be best interpreted with reference to Lotze’s concept of idealities(discussed in section 2b–c, above) Idealities are magnitudes, identifiable in experience, and are constitutive for all academic fields: science, mathematics, metaphysics. More especially, they help to orient our concepts and studies.

In more concrete terms, Lotze hung the intelligibility of natural processes on the concept of God because of his anthropological stance—of the role the concept of humanity played in his philosophy. Important point, however, is that, to him, that concept does not have a generic character; we can grasp it only in terms of particular individuals, or persons (p. 52). This explains why Lotze claimed that the kind of purposive, creative power seen in natural processes is unthinkable except in relation to a living personality with its will; and, since the process of nature emanate from no human will, we are left with the person of God (pp. 587 ff.).

Lotze’s use of God as a necessary explanatory category is reminiscent of Kant, and has a somewhat “methodological” quality about it—we cannot prove the existence of God, Lotze thought, but we must nonetheless believe in Him; for only thus is our world ultimately intelligible. This point of Lotze was interpreted by the religious liberals of the fin de siècle (by the Congregationalists, in particular) as supporting the claim that religion is a matter of judgment of value in the Kingdom of God—a thesis made popular by Lotze’s contemporary Albrecht Ritschl (1822–1889) who fought against the conservative-Lutheran and confessional theology of the time.

f. Religious Practice

Lotze understood world-religions to have started in the Orient, with the picture, familiar from the Old Testament, of the world as a system developing according to general laws. Later, the West accepted this belief in the form of Christianity. In the Age of Enlightenment, however, it started to consider the universe as something unfinished, giving opportunities to the individuals to form it according to the specific purposes of everyone. (This stance was theoretically grounded by Kant.) The future was seen as formless in principle, so that human action can change reality in an absolutely new way (Lotze 1864, p. 331). Embracing this view, the believers abandoned quietism and embraced vita activa. Reducing the horizons of human imagination to the practical tasks of the earthy world, the need to connect it with the transcendental waned. The result was the belief in progress and a turn away from God. From now on Godhood was considered mainly in moral terms.

Pagans, in their most developed form of antiquity, believed in reason, in self-respect, and in the sublime. (Lotze called this stance “heroism of the pure reason”.) Unfortunately, pagans failed to foster humaneness. This was the historical achievement of Christianity which developed a totally new understanding of the moral duties. Of course, pagans recognized moral duties too. However, they understood them as having the same necessity as natural laws have. To be more specific, Christianity—especially Protestantism—taught its believers to carry out duties following their personal conscience. In consequence, Christianity: (i) established an immediate connection to God; (ii) it made it possible for individual Christians to pursue their own values of preference which are independent from the social background of the individual and from her actual place in the society. In this way, the respect for human dignity was secured.

Historically, Christianity placed importance on the activity of teaching and learning through the establishment of schools.  . Christianity, however, is not simply a teaching. It requires faithfulness to the historical God, realized through revelation. That is why Christian dogmatics must be preserved and cultivated.

Lotze’s conclusion was that we must look upon Christian dogmatics as posing questions about the purpose of human life, not as giving answers. Lotze was confident that every new generation would return to these questions. Of course, dogmatics can be criticized: indeed, the critical Protestant theology was, historically, the best example of such criticism. But, according to Lotze, we must not cast Christian dogmatics away as obsolete.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1840) Gedichte, Leipzig: Weidmann.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1841a). Metaphysik, Leipzig: Weidmann.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1841b). “Bemerkungen über den Begriff des Raumes. Sendeschreiben an C. H. Weiße,” Zeitschrift für Philosophie und Spekulative Theologie 8: 1–24; in Lotze 1885/91, i, pp. 86–108.Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1843). Logik, Leipzig: Weidmann.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1845). Über den Begriff der Schönheit, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1852). Medicinische Psychologie, oder Physiologie der Seele, Leipzig: Weidmann.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1856a). Mikrokosmus: Ideen zur Naturgeschichte und Geschichte der Menschheit, Versuch einer Anthropologie, 1st vol., Leipzig: Hirzel. Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1856b). “Selbstanzeige des ersten Bandes des Mikrokosmus,” Göttinger gelehrte Anzeigen 199: 1977–92; in Lotze 1885/91, iii, pp. 303–14.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1857). Streitschriften, Part One, Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1858). Mikrokosmus, 2nd vol., Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1864). Mikrokosmus, 3rd vol., Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1864). Geschichte der Aesthetik in Deutschland, München: Cotta.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1874). Logik, Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1879). Metaphysik, Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1884). Outlines of Metaphysic, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1885). Microcosmus: An Essay Concerning Man and his Relation to the World, 2 vols., E. Hamilton and E. E. Constance Jones, Trans., Edinburgh: T. & T. Clark.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1885a). Outlines of Aesthetics, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1885b). Outlines of Practical Philosophy, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1885c). Outlines of Philosophy of Religion, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1885/91). Kleine Schriften, ed. by David Peipers, 4 vols., Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1886). Outlines of Psychology, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann. (1887). Outlines of Logic, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1887). Logic (B. Bosanquet et al., trans.), 2nd ed., Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (1888). Metaphysic (B. Bosanquet et al., trans.) 2nd ed., Oxford: Clarendon Press.Lotze, Rudolf Hermann.  (2003). Briefe und Dokumente, Zusammengestellt, eingeleitet und kommentiert von Reinhardt Pester, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Cuming, Agnes. (1917). “Lotze, Bradley, and Bosanquet”, Mind 26: 162–70.
  • Hartmann, Eduard von. (1888). Lotze’s Philosophie, Leipzig: Friedrich.
  • Kronenberg, Moritz. (1899). Moderne Philosophen, München: Beck.
  • Kuntz, P. G. (1971). “Rudolf Hermann Lotze, Philosopher and Critic”, Introduction to: Santayana 1889, pp. 3–94.
  • Milkov, Nikolay. (2001). “The History of Russell’s Concepts ‘Sense-data’ and ‘Knowledge by Acquaintan­ce’,” Archiv für Begriffsgeschichte 43: 221–31.
  • Milkov, Nikolay.  (2002). “Lotze’s Concept of ‘States of Affairs’ and its Critics,” Prima philosophia 15: 437–50.
  • Milkov, Nikolay.  (2008). “Russell’s Debt to Lotze,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, Part A, 39: 186–93.
  • Misch, Georg. (1912). “Einleitung”, in: Hermann Rudolf Lotze, Logik, hg. von G. Misch, Leipzig: Felix Meiner, pp. ix–cxxii.
  • Natorp, Paul. (1902). Platos Ideenlehre, Leipzig: Dürr.
  • Orth, E. W. (1986). “R. H. Lotze: Das Ganze unseres Welt- und Selbstverständnisses,” in: Josef Speck (ed.), Grundprobleme der großen Philosophen. Philosophie der Neuzeit IV, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, pp. 9–51.
  • Passmore, John. (1966). A Hundred Years of Philosophy; 2nd ed., Harmondsword: Penguin.
  • Perry, Ralf Barton. (1935). The Thought and Character of William James, 2 vols., Boston: Little, Brown, and Co.
  • Pester, Reinhardt. (1997). Hermann Lotze. Wege seines Denkens und Forschens, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Pester, Reinhardt. (2003). “Unterwegs von Göttingen nach Berlin: Hermann Lotzes Psychologie im Spannungsfeld von Psychologie und Philosophie,” in L. Sprung and W. Schönpflug (eds.), Zur Geschichte der Psychologie in Berlin, 2nd ed., Frankfurt: Peter Lang, pp. 125–51.
  • Russell, Bertrand. (1918). Mysticism and Logic, 3rd ed., London: Allen & Unwin, 1963.
  • Santayana, George. (1889). Lotze’s System of Philosophy, ed. by P. G. Kuntz, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1971.
  • Weiße, C. H. (1865). “Rezension von Mikrokosmus by H. Lotze,” Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 47: 272–315.

c. Bibliographies

  • Kuntz, P. G. (1971). “Lotze Bibliography”, in: Santayana 1889, pp. 233–69.
  • Pester, Reinhardt. (1997). “Bibliographie”, in: Pester, pp. 344–94.

d. Biographies

  • Falckenberg, Richard. (1901). Hermann Lotze, Stuttgart: Frommann.
  • Wentscher, Max. (1913). Hermann Lotze, Heidelberg: Winter.

e. Further Reading

  • Bauch, Bruno. (1918). “Lotzes Logik und ihre Bedeutung im deutschen Idealismus”, in: Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1: 45–58.
  • Devaux, Philippe. (1932). Lotze et Son Influence sur la Philosophie Anglo-Saxonne, Bruxelles: Lamartin.
  • Frege, Gottlob. (1883). “17 Key Sentences on Logic”, in: idem, Posthumous Writings, ed. by Brian McGuinness, Oxford: Blackwell, 1979, pp. 174–175.
  • Gabriel, Gottfried. (1989a). “Einleitung des Herausgebers. Lotze und die Entstehung der modernen Logik bei Frege”, in H. R. Lotze, Logik, Erstes Buch. Vom Denken, Hamburg: Meiner, xi–xliii.
  • Gabriel, Gottfried.  (1989b). “Einleitung des Herausgebers: Objektivität, Logik und Erkenntnistheorie bei Lotze und Frege”, in H. R. Lotze, Logik, Drittes Buch. Vom Erkennen (Methodologie), Hamburg: Meiner, xi–xxxiv.
  • Harte, Frederick E. (1913). The philosophical treatment of divine personality: from Spinoza to Hermann Lotze, London: C. H. Kelly.
  • Hauser, Kai. (2003). “Lotze and Husserl,” Archiv für die Geschichte der Philosophie 85: 152–78.
  • Heidegger, Martin. (1978). Frühe Schriften, Frankfurt: Klostermann.
  • Henry, Jones. (1895). A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Lotze: The Doctrine of Thought, Glasgow: MacLehose.
  • Kraushaar, Otto. (1938 / 1939). “Lotze as a Factor in the Development of James’s Radical Empiricism and Pluralism,” The Philosophical Review, 47: 517–26 / 49: 455–71.
  • Moore, Vida F. (1901). The Ethical Aspect of Lotze’s Metaphysics, New York: Macmillan.
  • Orth, E. W. (1984). “Dilthey und Lotze. Zur Wandlung des Philosophiebegriffs in 19. Jahrhundret,” Dilthey-Jahrbuch, 2: 140–58.
  • Robins, Edwin Proctor. (1900). Some Problems of Lotze’s Theory of Knowledge, New York: Macmillan.
  • Schoen, Henri. (1901). La Métaphysique de Hermann Lotze: La philosophie des Actions et des Réactions Réciproques, Paris: Fischbacher.
  • Stumpf, Carl. (1917). “Zum Gedächtnis Lotzes,” in: Kantstudien 22: 1–26.
  • Thomas, E. E. (1921). Lotze’s Theory of Reality, London: Longmans Green.
  • Valentine, C. W. (1911). The Philosophy of Lotze in its Theological Aspects, Glasgow: Robert Maclehose.
  • Wentscher, Max. (1924). Fechner und Lotze, München: Reinhardt.

Author Information

Nikolay Milkov
Universität Paderborn

Nietzsche, Friedrich

Friedrich Nietzsche (1844—1900)

NietzscheNietzsche was a German philosopher, essayist, and cultural critic. His writings on truth, morality, language, aesthetics, cultural theory, history, nihilism, power, consciousness, and the meaning of existence have exerted an enormous influence on Western philosophy and intellectual history.

Nietzsche spoke of "the death of God," and foresaw the dissolution of traditional religion and metaphysics. Some interpreters of Nietzsche believe he embraced nihilism, rejected philosophical reasoning, and promoted a literary exploration of the human condition, while not being concerned with gaining truth and knowledge in the traditional sense of those terms. However, other interpreters of Nietzsche say that in attempting to counteract the predicted rise of nihilism, he was engaged in a positive program to reaffirm life, and so he called for a radical, naturalistic rethinking of the nature of human existence, knowledge, and morality. On either interpretation, it is agreed that he suggested a plan for “becoming what one is” through the cultivation of instincts and various cognitive faculties, a plan that requires constant struggle with one’s psychological and intellectual inheritances.

Nietzsche claimed the exemplary human being must craft his/her own identity through self-realization and do so without relying on anything transcending that life—such as God or a soul.  This way of living should be affirmed even were one to adopt, most problematically, a radical vision of eternity, one suggesting the "eternal recurrence" of all events. According to some commentators, Nietzsche advanced a cosmological theory of “will to power.” But others interpret him as not being overly concerned with working out a general cosmology. Questions regarding the coherence of Nietzsche's views--questions such as whether these views could all be taken together without contradiction, whether readers should discredit any particular view if proven incoherent or incompatible with others, and the like--continue to draw the attention of contemporary intellectual historians and philosophers.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Periodization of Writings
  3. Problems of Interpretation
  4. Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values
  5. The Human Exemplar
  6. Will to Power
  7. Eternal Recurrence
  8. Reception of Nietzsche’s Thought
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Nietzsche’s Collected Works in German
    2. Nietzsche’s Major Works Available in English
    3. Important Works Available in English from Nietzsche’s Nachlass
    4. Biographies
    5. Commentaries and Scholarly Researches
    6. Academic Journals in Nietzsche Studies

1. Life

Because much of Nietzsche’s philosophical work has to do with the creation of self—or to put it in Nietzschean terms, “becoming what one is”— some scholars exhibit uncommon interest in the biographical anecdotes of Nietzsche’s life. Taking this approach, however, risks confusing aspects of the Nietzsche legend with what is important in his philosophical work, and many commentators are rightly skeptical of readings derived primarily from biographical anecdotes.

Friedrich Wilhelm Nietzsche was born October 15, 1844, the son of Karl Ludwig and Franziska Nietzsche. Karl Ludwig Nietzsche was a Lutheran Minister in the small Prussian town of Röcken, near Leipzig. When young Friedrich was not quite five, his father died of a brain hemorrhage, leaving Franziska, Friedrich, a three-year old daughter, Elisabeth, and an infant son. Friedrich’s brother died unexpectedly shortly thereafter (reportedly, the legend says, fulfilling Friedrich’s dream foretelling of the tragedy). These events left young Friedrich the only male in a household that included his mother, sister, paternal grandmother and an aunt, although Friedrich drew upon the paternal guidance of Franziska’s father. Young Friedrich also enjoyed the camaraderie of a few male playmates.

Upon the loss of Karl Ludwig, the family took up residence in the relatively urban setting of Naumburg, Saxony. Friedrich gained admittance to the prestigious Schulpforta, where he received Prussia’s finest preparatory education in the Humanities, Theology, and Classical Languages. Outside school, Nietzsche founded a literary and creative society with classmates including Paul Deussen (who was later to become a prominent scholar of Sanskrit and Indic Studies). In addition, Nietzsche played piano, composed music, and read the works of Emerson and the poet Friedrich Hölderlin, who was relatively unknown at the time.

In 1864 Nietzsche entered the University of Bonn, spending the better part of that first year unproductively, joining a fraternity and socializing with old and new acquaintances, most of whom would fall out of his life once he regained his intellectual focus. By this time he had also given up Theology, dashing his mother’s hopes of a career in the ministry for him. Instead, he choose the more humanistic study of classical languages and a career in Philology. In 1865 he followed his major professor, Friedrich Ritschl, from Bonn to the University of Leipzig and dedicated himself to the studious life, establishing an extracurricular society there devoted to the study of ancient texts. Nietzsche’s first contribution to this group was an essay on the Greek poet, Theognis, and it drew the attention of Professor Ritschl, who was so impressed that he published the essay in his academic journal, Rheinisches Museum. Other published writings by Nietzsche soon followed, and by 1868 (after a year of obligatory service in the Prussian military), young Friedrich was being promoted as something of a “phenomenon” in classical scholarship by Ritschl, whose esteem and praise landed Nietzsche a position as Professor of Greek Language and Literature at the University of Basel in Switzerland, even though the candidate had not yet begun writing his doctoral dissertation. The year was 1869 and Friedrich Nietzsche was 24 years old.

At this point in his life, however, Nietzsche was a far cry from the original thinker he would later become, since neither he nor his work had matured. Swayed by public opinion and youthful exuberance, he briefly interrupted teaching in 1870 to join the Prussian military, serving as a medical orderly at the outbreak of the Franco-Prussian War. His service was cut short, however, by severe bouts of dysentery and diphtheria. Back in Basel, his teaching responsibilities at the University and a nearby Gymnasium consumed much of his intellectual and physical energy. He became acquainted with the prominent cultural historian, Jacob Burkhardt, a well-established member of the university faculty. But, the person exerting the most influence on Nietzsche at this point was the artist, Richard Wagner, whom Nietzsche had met while studying in Leipzig. During the first half of the decade, Wagner and his companion, Cosima von Bülow, frequently entertained Nietzsche at Triebschen, their residence near Lake Lucerne, and then later at Bayreuth.

It is commonplace to say that at one time Nietzsche looked to Wagner with the admiration of a dutiful son. This interpretation of their relationship is supported by the fact that Wagner would have been the same age as Karl Ludwig, had the elder Nietzsche been alive. It is also commonplace to note that Nietzsche was in awe of the artist’s excessive displays of a fiery temperament, bravado, ambition, egoism, and loftiness— typical qualities demonstrating “genius” in the nineteenth century. In short, Nietzsche was overwhelmed by Wagner’s personality. A more mature Nietzsche would later look back on this relationship with some regret, although he never denied the significance of Wagner’s influence on his emotional and intellectual path, Nietzsche’s estimation of Wagner’s work would alter considerably over the course of his life. Nonetheless, in light of this relationship, one can easily detect Wagner’s presence in much of Nietzsche’s early writings, particularly in the latter chapters of The Birth of Tragedy and in the first and fourth essays of 1874’s Untimely Meditations. Also, Wagner’s supervision exerted considerable editorial control over Nietzsche’s intellectual projects, leading him to abandon, for example, 1873’s Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, which Wagner scorned because of its apparent irrelevance to his own work. Such pressures continued to bridle Nietzsche throughout the so-called early period. He broke free of Wagner’s dominance once and for all in 1877, after a series of emotionally charged episodes. Nietzsche’s fallout with Wagner, who had moved to Bayreuth by this time, led to the publication of 1878’s Human, All-Too Human, one of Nietzsche’s most pragmatic and un-romantic texts—the original title page included a dedication to Voltaire and a quote from Descartes.  If Nietzsche intended to use this text as a way of alienating himself from the Wagnerian circle, he surely succeeded. Upon its arrival in Bayreuth, the text ended this personal relationship with Wagner.

It would be an exaggeration to say that Nietzsche was not developing intellectually during the period, prior to 1877. In fact, figures other than Wagner drew Nietzsche’s interest and admiration. In addition to attending Burkhardt’s lectures at Basel, Nietzsche studied Greek thought from the Pre-Socratics to Plato, and he learned much about the history of philosophy from Friedrich Albert Lange’s massive History of Materialism, which Nietzsche once called “a treasure trove” of historical and philosophical names, dates, and currents of thought. In addition, Nietzsche was taken by the persona of the philosopher Arthur Schopenhauer, which Nietzsche claimed to have culled from close readings of the two-volume magnum opus, The World as Will and Representation.

Nietzsche discovered Schopenhauer while studying in Leipzig. Because his training at Schulpforta had elevated him far above most of his classmates, he frequently skipped lectures at Leipzig in order to devote time to [CE1] Schopenhauer’s philosophy. For Nietzsche, the most important aspect of this philosophy was the figure from which it emanated, representing for him the heroic ideal of a man in the life of thought: a near-contemporary thinker participating in that great and noble “republic of genius,” spanning the centuries of free thinking sages and creative personalities. That Nietzsche could not countenance Schopenhauer’s “ethical pessimism” and its negation of the will was recognized by the young man quite early during this encounter. Yet, even in Nietzsche’s attempts to construct a counter-posed “pessimism of strength” affirming the will, much of Schopenhauer’s thought remained embedded in Nietzsche’s philosophy, particularly during the early period. Nietzsche’s philosophical reliance on “genius”, his cultural-political visions of rank and order through merit, and his self-described (and later self-rebuked) “metaphysics of art” all had Schopenhauerian underpinnings. Also, Birth of Tragedy’s well-known dualism between the cosmological/aesthetic principles of Dionysus and Apollo, contesting and complimenting each other in the tragic play of chaos and order, confusion and individuation, strikes a familiar chord to readers acquainted with Schopenhauer’s description of the world as “will” and “representation.”

Despite these similarities, Nietzsche’s philosophical break with Schopenhauerian pessimism was as real as his break with Wagner’s domineering presence was painful. Ultimately, however, such triumphs were necessary to the development and liberation of Nietzsche as thinker, and they proved to be instructive as Nietzsche later thematized the importance of “self-overcoming” for the project of cultivating a free spirit.

The middle and latter part of the 1870s was a time of great upheaval in Nietzsche’s personal life. In addition to the turmoil with Wagner and related troubles with friends in the artist’s circle of admirers, Nietzsche suffered digestive problems, declining eyesight, migraines, and a variety of physical aliments, rendering him unable to fulfill responsibilities at Basel for months at a time. After publication of Birth of Tragedy, and despite its perceived success in Wagnerian circles for trumpeting the master’s vision for Das Kunstwerk der Zukunft (“The Art Work of the Future”) Nietzsche’s academic reputation as a philologist was effectively destroyed due in large part to the work’s apparent disregard for scholarly expectations characteristic of nineteenth-century philology. Birth of Tragedy was mocked as Zukunfts-Philologie (“Future Philology”) by Wilamowitz-Moellendorff, an up-and-coming peer destined for an illustrious career in Classicism, and even Ritschl characterized it as a work of “megalomania.” For these reasons, Nietzsche had difficulty attracting students. Even before the publication of Birth of Tragedy, he had attempted to re-position himself at Basel in the department of philosophy, but the University apparently never took such an endeavor seriously. By 1878, his circumstances at Basel deteriorated to the point that neither the University nor Nietzsche was very much interested in seeing him continue as a professor there, so both agreed that he should retire with a modest pension [CE2] . He was 34 years  old and now apparently liberated, not only from his teaching duties and the professional discipline he grew to despise, but also from the emotional and intellectual ties that dominated him during his youth. His physical woes, however, would continue to plague him for the remainder of his life.

After leaving Basel, Nietzsche enjoyed a period of great productivity. And, during this time, he was never to stay in one place for long, moving with the seasons, in search of relief for his ailments, solitude for his work, and reasonable living conditions, given his very modest budget. He often spent summers in the Swiss Alps in Sils Maria, near St. Moritz, and winters in Genoa, Nice, or Rappollo on the Mediterranean coast. Occasionally, he would visit family and friends in Naumburg or Basel, and he spent a great deal of time in social discourse, exchanging letters with friends and associates.

In the latter part of the 1880s, Nietzsche’s health worsened, and in the midst of an amazing flourish of intellectual activity which produced On the Genealogy of Morality, Twilight of the Idols, The Anti-Christ, and several other works (including preparation for what was intended to be his magnum opus, a work that editors later titled Will to Power) Nietzsche suffered a complete mental and physical breakdown. The famed moment at which Nietzsche is said to have succumbed irrevocably to his ailments occurred January 3, 1889 in Turin (Torino) Italy, reportedly outside Nietzsche’s apartment in the Piazza Carlos Alberto while embracing a horse being flogged by its owner.

After spending time in psychiatric clinics in Basel and Jena, Nietzsche was first placed in the care of his mother, and then later his sister (who had spent the latter half of the 1880’s attempting to establish a “racially pure” German colony in Paraguay with her husband, the anti-Semitic political opportunist Bernhard Foerster). By the early 1890s, Elisabeth had seized control of Nietzsche’s literary remains, which included a vast amount of unpublished writings. She quickly began shaping his image and the reception of his work, which by this time had already gained momentum among academics such as Georg Brandes. Soon the Nietzsche legend would grow in spectacular fashion among popular readers. From Villa Silberblick, the Nietzsche home in Weimar, Elisabeth and her associates managed Friedrich’s estate, editing his works in accordance with her taste for a populist decorum and occasionally with an ominous political intent that (later researchers agree) corrupted the original thought[CE3] . Unfortunately, Friedrich experienced little of his fame, having never recovered from the breakdown of late 1888 and early 1889. His final years were spent at Villa Silberblick in grim mental and physical deterioration, ending mercifully August 25, 1900. He was buried in Röcken, near Leipzig. Elisabeth spent one last year in Paraguay in 1892-93 before returning to Germany, where she continued to exert influence over the perception of Nietzsche’s work and reputation, particularly among general readers, until her death in 1935. Villa Silberblick stands today as a monument, of sorts, to Friedrich and Elisabeth, while the bulk of Nietzsche’s literary remains is held in the Goethe-Schiller Archiv, also in Weimar.

2. Periodization of Writings

Nietzsche scholars commonly divide his work into periods, usually with the implication that discernable shifts in Nietzsche’s circumstances and intellectual development justify some form of periodization in the corpus. The following division is typical:

(i.) before 1869—the juvenilia

Cautious Nietzsche biographers work to separate the facts of Nietzsche’s life from myth, and while a major part of the Nietzsche legend holds that Friedrich was a precocious child, writings from his youth bear witness to that part of the story. During this time Nietzsche was admitted into the prestigious Gymnasium Schulpforta; he composed music, wrote poetry and plays, and in 1863 produced an autobiography (at the age of 19). He also produced more serious and accomplished works on themes related to philology, literature, and philosophy. By 1866 he had begun contributing articles to a major philological journal, Rheinisches Museum, edited by Nietzsche’s esteemed professor at Bonn and Leipzig, Friedrich Ritschl. With Ritschl’s recommendation, Nietzsche was appointed professor of Greek Language and Literature at the University of Basel in January 1869.

(ii.) 1869-1876--the early period

Nietzsche’s writings during this time reflect interests in philology, cultural criticism, and aesthetics. His inaugural public lecture at Basel in May 1869, “Homer and Classical Philology” brought out aesthetic and scientific aspects of his discipline, portending Nietzsche’s attitudes towards science, art, philology and philosophy. He was influenced intellectually by the philosopher Arthur Schopenhauer and emotionally by the artist Richard Wagner. Nietzsche’s first published book, The Birth of Tragedy, appropriated Schopenhaurian categories of individuation and chaos in an elucidation of primordial aesthetic drives represented by the Greek gods Apollo and Dionysus. This text also included a Wagnerian precept for cultural flourishing: society must cultivate and promote its most elevated and creative types—the artistic genius. In the Preface to a later edition of this work, Nietzsche expresses regret for having attempted to elaborate a “metaphysics of art.” In addition to these themes, Nietzsche’s interest during this period extended to Greek philosophy, intellectual history, and the natural sciences, all of which were significant to the development of his mature thought. Nietzsche’s second book-length project, The Untimely Meditations, contains four essays written from 1873-1876. It is a work of acerbic cultural criticism, encomia to Schopenhauer and Wagner, and an unexpectedly idiosyncratic analysis of the newly developing historical consciousness. A fifth meditation on the discipline of philology is prepared but left unpublished. Plagued by poor health, Nietzsche is released from teaching duties in February 1876 (his affiliation with the university officially ends in 1878 and he is granted a small pension).

(iii.) 1877-1882—the middle period

During this time Nietzsche liberated himself from the emotional grip of Wagner and the artist’s circle of admirers, as well as from those ideas which (as he claims in Ecce Homo) “did not belong” to him in his “nature” (“Human All Too Human: With Two Supplements” 1).  Reworking earlier themes such as tragedy in philosophy, art and truth, and the human exemplar, Nietzsche’s thinking now comes into sharper focus, and he sets out on a philosophical path to be followed the remainder of his productive life. In this period’s three published works Human, All-Too Human (1878-79), Dawn (1881), and The Gay Science (1882), Nietzsche takes up writing in an aphoristic style, which permits exploration of a variety of themes. Most importantly, Nietzsche lays out a plan for  “becoming what one is” through the cultivation of instincts and various cognitive faculties, a plan that requires constant struggle with one’s psychological and intellectual inheritances. Nietzsche discovers that “one thing is needful” for the exemplary human being: to craft an identity from otherwise dissociated events bringing forth the horizons of one’s existence. Self-realization, as it is conceived in these texts, demands the radicalization of critical inquiry with a historical consciousness and then a “retrograde step” back (Human aphorism 20) from what is revealed in such examinations, insofar as these revelations threaten to dissolve all metaphysical realities and leave nothing but the abysmal comedy of existence. A peculiar kind of meaningfulness is thus gained by the retrograde step: it yields a purpose for existence, but in an ironic form, perhaps esoterically and without ground; it is transparently nihilistic to the man with insight, but suitable for most; susceptible to all sorts of suspicion, it is nonetheless necessary and for that reason enforced by institutional powers. Nietzsche calls the one who teaches the purpose of existence a “tragic hero” (GS 1), and the one who understands the logic of the retrograde step a “free spirit.” Nietzsche’s account of this struggle for self-realization and meaning leads him to consider problems related to metaphysics, religion, knowledge, aesthetics, and morality.

(iv.) Post-1882—the later period

Nietzsche transitions into a new period with the conclusion of The Gay Science (Book IV) and his next published work, the novel Thus Spoke Zarathustra, produced in four parts between 1883 and 1885. Also in 1885 he returns to philosophical writing with Beyond Good and Evil. In 1886 he attempts to consolidate his inquiries through self-criticism in Prefaces written for the earlier published works, and he writes a fifth book for The Gay Science. In 1887 he writes On the Genealogy of Morality. In 1888, with failing health, he produces several texts, including The Twilight of the Idols, The Anti-Christ, Ecce Homo, and two works concerning his prior relationship with Wagner. During this period, as with the earlier ones, Nietzsche produces an abundance of materials not published during his lifetime. These works constitute what is referred to as Nietzsche’s Nachlass. (For years this material has been published piecemeal in Germany and translated to English in various collections.) Philosophically, during this period, Nietzsche continues his explorations on morality, truth, aesthetics, history, power, language and identity. For some readers, he appears to be broadening the scope of his ideas to work out a cosmology involving the all encompassing “will to power” and the curiously related and enigmatic “eternal recurrence of the same.” Prior claims regarding the retrograde step are re-thought, apparently in favor of seeking some sort of breakthrough into the “abyss of light” (Zarathustra’s “Before Sunrise”) or in an encounter with “decadence” (“Expeditions of a Untimely Man” 43, in Twilight of the Idols). The intent here seems to be an overcoming or dissolution of metaphysics.  These developments are matters of contention, however, as some commentators maintain that statements regarding Nietzsche’s “cosmological vision” are exaggerated. And, some will even deny that he achieves (nor even attempts) the overcoming described above. Despite such complaints, interpreters of Nietzsche continue to reference these ineffable concepts.

3. Problems of Interpretation

Nietzsche’s work in the beginning was heavily influenced, either positively or negatively, by the events of his young life. His early and on-going interest in the Greeks, for example, can be attributed in part to his Classical education at Schulpforta, for which he was well-prepared as a result of his family’s attempts to steer him into the ministry. Nietzsche’s intense association with Wagner no doubt enhanced his orientation towards the philosophy of Schopenhauer, and it probably promoted his work in aesthetics and cultural criticism. These biographical elements came to bear on Nietzsche’s first major works, while the middle period amounts to a confrontation with many of these influences. In Nietzsche’s later  writings  we find the development of concepts that seem less tangibly related to the biographical events of his life.

Let's outline four of these concepts, but not before adding a word of caution regarding how this outline should be received. Nietzsche asserts in the opening section of Twilight of the Idols that he “mistrusts systematizers” (“Maxims and Arrows” 26), which is taken by some readers to be a declaration of his fundamental stance towards philosophical systems, with the additional inference that nothing resembling such a system must be permitted to stand in interpretations of his thought. Although it would not be illogical to say that Nietzsche mistrusted philosophical systems, while nevertheless building one of his own, some commentators point out two important qualifications. First, the meaning of Nietzsche’s stated “mistrust” in this brief aphorism can and should be treated with caution. In Beyond Good and Evil Nietzsche claims that philosophers today, after millennia of dogmatizing about absolutes, now have a “duty to mistrust” philosophy’s dogmatizing tendencies (BGE 34). Yet, earlier in that same text, Nietzsche  claimed that all philosophical interpretations of nature are acts of will  power (BGE 9) and that his interpretations are subject to the same critique (BGE 22).   In Thus Spoke Zarathustra’s “Of Involuntary Bliss” we find Zarathustra speaking of his own “mistrust,” when he describes the happiness that has come to him in the “blissful hour” of the third part of that book. Zarathustra attempts to chase away this bliss while waiting for the arrival of his unhappiness, but his happiness draws “nearer and nearer to him,” because he does not chase after it. In the next scene we find Zarathustra dwelling in the “light abyss” of the pure open sky, “before sunrise.” What then is the meaning of this “mistrust”? At the very least, we can say that Nietzsche does not intend it to establish a strong and unmovable absolute, a negative-system, from which dogma may be drawn. Nor, possibly, is Nietzsche’s mistrust of systematizers absolutely clear. Perhaps it is a discredit to Nietzsche as a philosopher that he did not elaborate his position more carefully within this tension; or, perhaps such uncertainty has its own ground.  Commentators such as Mueller-Lauter have noticed ambivalence in Nietzsche’s work on this very issue, and it seems plausible that Nietzsche mistrusted systems while nevertheless constructing something like a system countenancing this mistrust. He says something akin to this, after all, in Beyond Good and Evil, where it is claimed that even science’s truths are matters of interpretation, while admitting that this bold claim is also an interpretation and “so much the better” (aphorism 22). For a second cautionary note, many commentators will argue along with Richard Schacht that, instead of building a system, Nietzsche is concerned only with the exploration of problems, and that his kind of philosophy is limited to the interpretation and evaluation of cultural inheritances (1995). Other commentators will attempt to complement this sort of interpretation and, like Löwith, presume that the ground for Nietzsche’s explorations may also be examined. Löwith and others argue that this ground concerns Nietzsche’s encounter with historical nihilism. The following outline should be received, then, with the understanding that Nietzsche’s own iconoclastic nature, his perspectivism, and his life-long projects of genealogical critique and the revaluation of values, lend credence to those anti-foundational readings which seek to emphasize only those exploratory aspects of Nietzsche’s work while refuting even implicit submissions to an orthodox interpretation of “the one Nietzsche” and his “one system of thought.” With this caution, the following outline is offered as one way of grounding Nietzsche’s various explorations.

The four major concepts presented in this outline are:

  • (i)  Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values, which is embodied by a historical event, “the death of God,” and which entails, somewhat problematically, the project of transvaluation;
  • (ii) The Human Exemplar, which takes many forms in Nietzsche’s thought, including the “tragic artist”, the “sage”, the “free spirit”, the “philosopher of the future”, the Übermensch (variously translated in English as “Superman,” “Overman,” “Overhuman,” and the like), and perhaps others (the case could be made, for example, that in Nietzsche’s notoriously self-indulgent and self-congratulatory Ecce Homo, the role of the human exemplar is played by “Mr. Nietzsche” himself);
  • (iii) Will to Power (Wille zur Macht), from a naturalized history of morals and truth developing through subjective feelings of power to a cosmology;
  • (iv)  Eternal Recurrence or Eternal Return (variously in Nietzsche’s work, “die ewige Wiederkunft” or “die ewige Wiederkehr”) of the Same (des Gleich), a solution to the riddle of temporality without purpose.


4. Nihilism and the Revaluation of Values

Although Michael Gillespie makes a strong case that Nietzsche misunderstood nihilism, and in any event Nietzsche’s Dionysianism would be a better place to look for an anti-metaphysical breakthrough in Nietzsche’s corpus (1995, 178), commentators as varied in philosophical orientation as Heidegger and Danto have argued that nihilism is a central theme in Nietzsche’s philosophy. Why is this so? The constellation of Nietzsche’s fundamental concepts moves within his general understanding of modernity’s historical situation in the late nineteenth century. In this respect, Nietzsche’s thought carries out the Kantian project of “critique” by applying the nineteenth century’s developing historical awareness to problems concerning the possibilities of knowledge, truth, and human consciousness. Unlike Kant’s critiques, Nietzsche’s examinations find no transcendental ego, given that even the categories of experience are historically situated and likewise determined. Unlike Hegel’s notion of historical consciousness, however, history for Nietzsche has no inherent teleology. All beginnings and ends, for Nietzsche, are thus lost in a flood of indeterminacy. As early as 1873, Nietzsche was arguing that human reason is only one of many peculiar developments in the ebb and flow of time, and when there are no more rational animals nothing of absolute value will have transpired (“On truth and lies in a non-moral sense”). Some commentators would prefer to consider these sorts of remarks as belonging to Nietzsche’s “juvenilia.” Nevertheless, as late as 1888’s “Reason in Philosophy” from Twilight of the Idols, Nietzsche derides philosophers who would make a “fetish” out of reason and retreat into the illusion of a “de-historicized” world. Such a philosopher is “decadent,” symptomatic of a “declining life”. Opposed to this type, Nietzsche valorizes the “Dionysian” artist whose sense of history affirms “all that is questionable and terrible in existence.”

Nietzsche’s philosophy contemplates the meaning of values and their significance to human existence. Given that no absolute values exist, in Nietzsche’s worldview, the evolution of values on earth must be measured by some other means. How then shall they be understood? The existence of a value presupposes a value-positing perspective, and values are created by human beings (and perhaps other value-positing agents) as aids for survival and growth. Because values are important for the well being of the human animal, because belief in them is essential to our existence, we oftentimes prefer to forget that values are our own creations and to live through them as if they were absolute. For these reasons, social institutions enforcing adherence to inherited values are permitted to create self-serving economies of power, so long as individuals living through them are thereby made more secure and their possibilities for life enhanced. Nevertheless, from time to time the values we inherit are deemed no longer suitable and the continued enforcement of them no longer stands in the service of life. To maintain allegiance to such values, even when they no longer seem practicable, turns what once served the advantage to individuals to a disadvantage, and what was once the prudent deployment of values into a life denying abuse of power. When this happens the human being must reactivate its creative, value-positing capacities and construct new values.

Commentators will differ on the question of whether nihilism for Nietzsche refers specifically to a state of affairs characterizing specific historical moments, in which inherited values have been exposed as superstition and have thus become outdated, or whether Nietzsche means something more than this. It is, at the very least, accurate to say that for Nietzsche nihilism has become a problem by the nineteenth century. The scientific, technological, and political revolutions of the previous two hundred years put an enormous amount of pressure on the old world order. In this environment, old value systems were being dismantled under the weight of newly discovered grounds for doubt. The possibility arises, then, that nihilism for Nietzsche is merely a temporary stage in the refinement of true belief. This view has the advantage of making Nietzsche’s remarks on truth and morality seem coherent from a pragmatic standpoint, in that with this view the problem of nihilism is met when false beliefs have been identified and corrected. Reason is not a value, in this reading, but rather the means by which human beings examine their metaphysical presuppositions and explore new avenues to truth.

Yet, another view will have it that by nihilism Nietzsche is pointing out something even more unruly at work, systemically, in the Western world’s axiomatic orientation. Heidegger, for example, claims that with the problem of nihilism Nietzsche is showing us the essence of Western metaphysics and its system of values (“The Word of Nietzsche: ‘God is dead’”). According to this view, Nietzsche’s philosophy of value, with its emphasis on the value-positing gesture, implies that even the concept of truth in the Western worldview leads to arbitrary determinations of value and political order and that this worldview is disintegrating under the weight of its own internal logic (or perhaps “illogic”). In this reading, the history of truth in the occidental world is the  “history of an error” (Twilight of the Idols), harboring profoundly disruptive antinomies which lead, ultimately, to the undoing of the Western philosophical framework. This kind of systemic flaw is exposed by the historical consciousness of the nineteenth century, which makes the problem of nihilism seem all the more acutely related to Nietzsche’s historical situation. But to relegate nihilism to that situation, according to Heidegger, leaves our thinking of it incomplete.

Heidegger makes this stronger claim with the aid of Nietzsche’s Nachlass. Near the beginning of the aphorisms collected under the title, Will To Power (aphorism 2), we find this note from 1887: “What does nihilism mean? That the highest values devalue themselves The aim is lacking; “why?” finds no answer.”  Here, Nietzsche’s answer regarding the meaning of nihilism has three parts. The first part makes a claim about the logic of values: ultimately, given the immense breadth of time, even “the highest values devalue themselves.”no long t use of such values into an abuse of the longer useful, turns what was once perhaps advan What does this mean?” According to Nietzsche, the conceptual framework known as Western metaphysics was first articulated by Plato, who had pieced together remnants of a declining worldview, borrowing elements from predecessors such as Anaximander, Parmenides, and especially Socrates, in order to overturn a cosmology that had been in play from the days of Homer and which found its fullest and last expression in the thought of Heraclitus. Plato’s framework was popularized by Christianity, which added egalitarian elements along with the virtue of pity. The maturation of Western metaphysics occurs during modernity’s scientific and political revolutions, wherein the effects of its inconsistencies, malfunctions, and mal-development become acute. At this point, according to Nietzsche, “the highest values devalue themselves,” as modernity’s striving for honesty, probity, and courage in the search for truth, those all-important virtues inhabiting the core of scientific progress, strike a fatal blow against the foundational idea of absolutes. Values most responsible for the scientific revolution, however, are also crucial to the metaphysical system that modern science is destroying. Such values are threatening, then, to bring about the destruction of their own foundations. Thus, the highest values are devaluing themselves at the core. Most importantly, the values of honesty, probity, and courage in the search for truth no longer seem compatible with the guarantee, the bestowal, and the bestowing agent of an absolute value. Even the truth of “truth” now falls prey to the workings of nihilism, given that Western metaphysics now appears groundless in this logic.

For some commentators, this line of interpretation leaves Nietzsche’s revaluation of values lost in contradiction. What philosophical ground, after all, could support revaluation if this interpretation were accurate? For this reason, readers such as Clark work to establish a coherent theory of truth in Nietzsche’s philosophy, which can apparently be done by emphasizing various parts of the corpus to the exclusion of others. If, indeed, a workable epistemology may be derived from reading specific passages, and good reasons can be given for prioritizing those passages, then consistent grounds may exist for Nietzsche having leveled a critique of morality. Such readings, however, seem incompatible with Nietzsche’s encounter with historical nihilism, unless nihilism is taken to represent merely a temporary stage in the refinement of Western humanity’s acquisition of knowledge.

With the stronger claim, however, Nietzsche’s critique of the modern situation implies that the “highest values [necessarily] devalue themselves.” Western metaphysics brings about its own disintegration, in working out the implications of its inner logic. Nietzsche’s name for this great and terrible event, capturing popular imagination with horror and disgust, is the “death of God.” Nietzsche acknowledges that a widespread understanding of this event, the “great noon” at which all “shadows of God” will be washed out, is still to come. In Nietzsche’s day, the God of the old metaphysics is still worshiped, of course, and would be worshiped, he predicted, for years to come. But, Nietzsche insisted, in an intellectual climate that demands honesty in the search for truth and proof as a condition for belief, the absence of foundations has already been laid bare. The dawn of a new day had broken, and shadows now cast, though long, were receding by the minute.

The second part of the answer to the question concerning nihilism states that “the aim is lacking.” What does this mean? In Beyond Good and Evil Nietzsche claims that the logic of an existence lacking inherent meaning demands, from an organizational standpoint, a value-creating response, however weak this response might initially be in comparison to how its values are then taken when enforced by social institutions (aphorisms 20-23).  Surveys of various cultures show that humanity’s most indispensable creation, the affirmation of meaning and purpose, lies at the heart of all fundamental values. Nihilism stands not only for that apparently inevitable process by which the highest values devalue themselves. It also stands for that moment of recognition in which human existence appears, ultimately, to be in vain. Nietzsche’s surveys of cultures and their values, his cultural anthropologies, are typically reductive in the extreme, attempting to reach the most important sociopolitical questions as neatly and quickly as possible. Thus, when examining so-called Jewish, Oriental, Roman, or Medieval European cultures Nietzsche asks, “how was meaning and purpose proffered and secured here? How, and for how long, did the values here serve the living? What form of redemption was sought here, and was this form indicative of a healthy life? What may one learn about the creation of values by surveying such cultures?” This version of nihilism then means that absolute aims are lacking and that cultures naturally attempt to compensate for this absence with the creation of goals.

The third part of the answer to the question concerning nihilism states that “‘why?’ finds no answer.” Who is posing the question here? Emphasis is laid on the one who faces the problem of nihilism. The problem of value-positing concerns the one who posits values, and this one must be examined, along with a corresponding evaluation of relative strengths and weaknesses. When, indeed, “why?” finds no answer, nihilism is complete. The danger here is that the value-positing agent might become paralyzed, leaving the call of life’s most dreadful question unanswered. In regards to this danger, Nietzsche’s most important cultural anthropologies examined the Greeks from Homer to the age of tragedy and the “pre-Platonic” philosophers. Here was evidence, Nietzsche believed, that humanity could face the dreadful truth of existence without becoming paralyzed. At every turn, the moment in which the Greek world’s highest values devalued themselves, when an absolute aim was shown to be lacking, the question “why?’ nevertheless called forth an answer. The strength of Greek culture is evident in the gods, the tragic art, and the philosophical concepts and personalities created by the Greeks themselves. Comparing the creativity of the Greeks to the intellectual work of modernity, the tragic, affirmative thought of Heraclitus to the pessimism of Schopenhauer, Nietzsche highlights a number of qualitative differences. Both types are marked by the appearance of nihilism, having been drawn into the inevitable logic of value-positing and what it would seem to indicate. The Greek type nevertheless demonstrates the characteristics of strength by activating and re-intensifying the capacity to create, by overcoming paralysis, by willing a new truth, and by affirming the will. The other type displays a pessimism of weakness, passivity, and weariness—traits typified by Schopenhauer’s life-denying ethics of the will turning against itself. In Nietzsche’s 1888 retrospection on the Birth of Tragedy in Ecce Homo, we read that “Hellenism and Pessimism” would have made a more precise title for the first work, because Nietzsche claims to have attempted to demonstrate how

the Greeks got rid of pessimism—with what they overcame it….Precisely tragedy is the proof that the Greeks were no pessimists: Schopenhauer  blundered in this as he blundered in everything (“The Birth of Tragedy” in Ecce Homo section 1).

From Twilight of the Idols, also penned during that sublime year of 1888, Nietzsche writes that tragedy “has to be considered the decisive repudiation” of pessimism as Schopenhauer understood it:

affirmation of life, even in its strangest and sternest problems, the will to life rejoicing in its own inexhaustibility through the sacrifice of its highest types—that is what I called Dionysian….beyond [Aristotelian] pity and terror, to realize in oneself the eternal joy of becoming—that joy which also encompasses joy in destruction (“What I Owe the Ancients” 5).

Nietzsche concludes the above passage by claiming to be the “last disciple of the philosopher Dionysus” (which by this time in Nietzsche’s thought came to encompass the whole of that movement which formerly distinguished between Apollo and Dionysus). Simultaneously, Nietzsche declares himself, with great emphasis, to be the “teacher of the eternal recurrence.”

The work to overcome pessimism is tragic in a two-fold sense: it maintains a feeling for the absence of ground, while responding to this absence with the creation of something meaningful. This work is also unmodern, according to Nietzsche, since modernity either has yet to ask the question “why?,” in any profound sense or, in those cases where the question has been posed, it has yet to come up with a response. Hence, a pessimism of weakness and an incomplete form of nihilism prevail in the modern epoch. Redemption in this life is denied, while an uncompleted form of nihilism remains the fundamental condition of humanity. Although the logic of nihilism seems inevitable, given the absence of absolute purpose and meaning, “actively” confronting nihilism and completing our historical encounter with it will be a sign of good health and the “increased power of the spirit” (Will to Power aphorism 22). Thus far, however, modernity’s attempts to “escape nihilism” (in turning away) have only served to “make the problem more acute” (aphorism 28). Why, then, this failure? What does modernity lack?

5. The Human Exemplar

How and why do nihilism and the pessimism of weakness prevail in modernity? Again, from the notebook of 1887 (Will to Power, aphorism 27), we find two conditions for this situation:

1. the higher species is lacking, i.e., those whose inexhaustible fertility and power keep up the faith in man….[and] 2. the lower species (‘herd,’ ‘mass,’ ‘society,’) unlearns modesty and blows up its needs into cosmic and metaphysical values. In this way the whole of existence is vulgarized: insofar as the mass is dominant it bullies the exceptions, so they lose their faith in themselves and become nihilists.

With the fulfillment of “European nihilism” (which is no doubt, for Nietzsche, endemic throughout the Western world and anyplace touched by “modernity”), and the death of otherworldly hopes for redemption, Nietzsche imagines two possible responses:  the easy response, the way of the “herd” and “the last man,” or the difficult response, the way of the “exception,” and the Übermensch.

Ancillary to any discussion of the exception, per se, the compatibility of the Übermensch concept with other movements in Nietzsche’s thought, and even the significance that Nietzsche himself placed upon it, has been the subject of intense debate among Nietzsche scholars. The term’s appearance in Nietzsche’s corpus is limited primarily to Thus Spoke Zarathustra and works directly related to this text. Even here, moreover, the Übermensch is only briefly and very early announced in the narrative, albeit with a tremendous amount of fanfare, before fading from explicit consideration. In addition to these problems, there are debates concerning the basic nature of the Übermensch itself, whether “Über-” refers to a transitional movement or a transmogrified state of being, and whether Nietzsche envisioned the possibility of a community of Übermenschen, as opposed to a solitary figure among lesser types. So, what should be made of Nietzsche’s so-called “overman” (or even “superman”) called upon to arrive after the “death of God”?

Whatever else may be said about the Übermensch, Nietzsche clearly had in mind an exemplary figure and an exception among humans, one “whose inexhaustible fertility and power keep up the faith in man.” For some commentators, Nietzsche’s distinction between overman and the last man has political ramifications. The hope for an overman figure to appear would seem to be permissible for one individual, many, or even a social ideal, depending on the culture within which it appears. Modernity, in Nietzsche’s view, is in such a state of decadence that it would be fortunate, indeed, to see the emergence of even one such type, given that modern sociopolitical arrangements are more conducive to creating the egalitarian “last man” who “blinks” at expectations for rank, self-overcoming, and striving for greatness. The last men are “ the most harmful to the species because they preserve their existence as much at the expense of the truth as at the expense of the future” (“Why I am a Destiny” in Ecce Homo 1). Although Nietzsche never lays out a precise political program from these ideas, it is at least clear that theoretical justifications for complacency or passivity are antithetical to his philosophy. What, then, may be said about Nietzsche as political thinker?   Nietzsche’s political sympathies are definitely not democratic in any ordinary way of thinking about that sort of arrangement. Nor are they socialist or  Marxist.

Nietzsche’s political sympathies have been called “aristocratic,” which is accurate enough only if one does not confuse the term with European royalty, landed gentry, old money or the like and if one keeps in mind the original Greek meaning of the term, “aristos,” which meant “the good man, the man with power.” A certain ambiguity exists, for Nietzsche, in the term “good man.” On the one hand, the modern, egalitarian “good man,” the “last man,” expresses hostility for those types willing to impose measures of rank and who would dare to want greatness and to strive for it. Such hostilities are born out of ressentiment and inherited from Judeo-Christian moral value systems. (Beyond Good and Evil 257-260 and On the Genealogy of Morals essay 1). “Good” in this sense is opposed to “evil,” and the “good man” is the one whose values support the “herd” and whose condemnations are directed at those whose thoughts and actions might disrupt the complacent normalcy of modern life. On the other hand, the kind of “good man” who might overcome the weak pessimism of “herd morality,” the man of strength, a man to confront nihilism, and thus a true benefactor to humanity, would be decidedly “unmodern” and “out of season.” Only such a figure would “keep up the faith in man.” For these reasons, some commentators have found in Nietzsche an existentialist program for the heroic individual dissociated in varying degrees from political considerations. Such readings however ignore or discount Nietzsche’s interest in historical processes and the unavoidable inference that although Nietzsche’s anti-egalitarianism might lead to questionably “unmodern” political conclusions, hierarchy nevertheless implies association.

The distinction between the good man of active power and the other type also points to ambiguity in the concept of freedom. For the hopeless, human freedom is conceived negatively in the “freedom from” restraints, from higher expectations, measures of rank, and the striving for greatness. While the higher type, on the other hand, understands freedom positively in the “freedom for” achievement, for revaluations of values, overcoming nihilism, and self-mastery.

Nietzsche frequently points to such exceptions as they have appeared throughout history—Napoleon is one of his favorite examples. In modernity, the emergence of such figures seems possible only as an isolated event, as a flash of lightening from the dark cloud of humanity. Was there ever a culture, in contrast to modernity, which saw these sorts of higher types emerge in congress as a matter of expectation and design? Nietzsche’s early philological studies on the Greeks, such as Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, The Pre-Platonic Philosophers, “Homer on Competition,” and “The Greek State,” concur that, indeed, the ancient world before Plato produced many exemplary human beings, coming forth independently of each other but “hewn from the same stone,” made possible by the fertile cultural milieu, the social expectation of greatness, and opportunities to prove individual merit in various competitive arenas. Indeed, Greek athletic contests, festivals of music and tragedy, and political life reflected, in Nietzsche’s view, a general appreciation for competition, rank, ingenuity, and the dynamic variation of formal structures of all sorts. Such institutions thereby promoted the elevation of human exemplars. Again, the point must be stressed here that the historical accuracy of Nietzsche’s interpretation of the Greeks is no more relevant to his philosophical schemata than, for example, the actual signing of a material document is to a contractarian political theory. What is important for Nietzsche, throughout his career, is the quick evaluation of social order and heirarchies, made possible for the first time in the nineteenth century by the newly developed “historical sense” (BGE 224) through which Nietzsche draws sweeping conclusions regarding, for example, the characteristics of various moral and religious epochs (BGE 32 and 55), which are themselves pre-conditioned by the material origins of consciousness, from which a pre-human animal acquires the capacity (even the “right”) to make promises and develops into the “sovereign individual” who then bears responsibility for his or her actions and thoughts (GM II.2).

Like these rather ambitious conclusions, Nietzsche’s valorization of the Greeks is partly derived from empirical evidence and partly confected in myth, a methodological concoction that Nietzsche draws from his philological training. If the Greeks, as a different interpretation would have them, bear little resemblance to Nietzsche’s reading, such a difference would have little relevance to Nietzsche’s fundamental thoughts. Later Nietzsche is also clear that his descriptions of the Greeks should not be taken programmatically as a political vision for the future (see for example GS 340).

The “Greeks” are one of Nietzsche’s best exemplars of hope against a meaningless existence, hence his emphasis on the Greek world’s response to the “wisdom of Silenus” in Birth of Tragedy. (ch. 5). If the sovereign individual represents history’s “ripest fruit”, the most recent millennia have created, through rituals of revenge and punishment, a “bad conscience.” The human animal thereby internalizes material forces into feelings of guilt and duty, while externalizing a spirit thus created with hostility towards existence itself (GM II.21). Compared to this typically Christian manner of forming human experiences, the Greeks deified “the animal in man” and thereby kept “bad conscience at bay” (GM II.23).

In addition to exemplifying the Greeks in the early works, Nietzsche lionizes the “artist-genius” and the “sage;” during the middle period he writes confidently, at first, and then longingly about the “scientist,” the “philosopher of the future,” and the “free spirit;” Zarathustra’s decidedly sententious oratory heralds the coming of the Übermensch; the periods in which “revaluation” comes to the fore finds value in the destructive influences of the “madman,” the “immoralist,” the “buffoon,” and even the “criminal.” Finally, Nietzsche’s last works reflect upon his own image, as the “breaker of human history into two,” upon “Mr. Nietzsche,” the “anti-Christian,” the self-anointed clever writer of great books, the creator of Zarathustra, the embodiment of human destiny and humanity’s greatest benefactor: “only after me,” Nietzsche claims in Ecce Homo, “is it possible to hope again” (“Why I am a Destiny” 1). It should be cautioned that important differences exist in the way Nietzsche conceives of each of these various figures, differences that reflect the development of Nietzsche’s philosophical work throughout the periods of his life. For this reason, none of these exemplars should be confused for the others. The bombastic “Mr. Nietzsche” of Ecce Homo is no more the “Übermensch” of Thus Spoke Zarathustra, for example, than the “Zarathustra” character is a “pre-Platonic philosopher” or the alienated, cool, sober, and contemptuous “scientist” is a “tragic artist,” although these figures will frequently share characteristics. Yet, a survey of these exceptions shows that Nietzsche’s philosophy, in his own estimation, needs the apotheosis of a human exemplar, perhaps to keep the search for meaning and redemption from abdicating the earth in metaphysical retreat, perhaps to avert the exhaustion of human creativity, to reawaken the instincts, to inspire the striving for greatness, to remind us that “this has happened once and is therefore a possibility,” or perhaps simply to bestow the “honey offering” of a very useful piece of folly. This need explains the meaning of the parodic fourth book of Zarathustra, which opens with the title character reflecting on the whole of his teachings: “I am he…who once bade himself, and not in vain: ‘Become what you are!’” The subtitle of Nietzsche’s autobiographical Ecce Homo, “How One Becomes What One Is,” strikes a similar chord.

6. Will to Power

The exemplar expresses hope not granted from metaphysical illusions. After sharpening the critique of art and genius during the positivistic period, Nietzsche seems more cautious about heaping praise upon specific historical figures and types, but even when he could no longer find an ideal exception, he nevertheless deemed it requisite to fabricate one in myth. Whereas exceptional humans of the past belong to an exalted “republic of genius,” those of the future, those belonging to human destiny, embody humanity’s highest hopes. As a result of this development, some commentators will emphasize the “philosophy of the future” as one of Nietzsche’s most important ideas. Work pursued in service of the future constitutes for Nietzsche an earthly form of redemption. Yet, exemplars of type, whether in the form of isolated individuals like Napoleon, or of whole cultures like the Greeks, are not caught up in petty historical politics or similar mundane endeavors. According to Nietzsche in Twilight of the Idols, their regenerative powers are necessary for the work of interpreting the meaning and sequence of historical facts.

My Conception of the genius—Great men, like great epochs, are explosive material in whom tremendous energy has been accumulated; their prerequisite has always been, historically and psychologically, that a protracted assembling, accumulating, economizing and preserving has preceded them—that there has been no explosion for a long time. If the tension in the mass has grown too great the merest accidental stimulus suffices to call the “genius,” the “deed,” the great destiny, into the world. Of what account then are circumstances, the epoch, the Zeitgeist, public opinion!...Great human beings are necessary, the epoch in which they appear is accidental… (“Expeditions of an Untimely Man,” 44).

It is with this understanding of the “great man” that Nietzsche, in Ecce Homo, proclaims even himself a great man, “dynamite,”“breaking the history of humanity in two” (“Why I am a Destiny” 1 and 8). A human exemplar, interpreted affirmatively in service of a hopeful future, is a “great event” denoting qualitative differences amidst the play of historical determinations. Thus, it belongs, in this reading, to Nietzsche’s cosmological vision of an indifferent nature marked occasionally by the boundary-stones of noble and sometimes violent uprisings.

To what extent is Nietzsche entitled to such a vision? Unlike nihilism, pessimism, and the death of God, which are historically, scientifically, and sometimes logically derived, Nietzsche’s “yes-saying” concepts seem to be derived from intuition, although Nietzsche will frequently support even these great hopes with bits of inductive reasoning. Nietzsche attempts to describe the logical structure of great events, as if a critical understanding of them pertains to their recurrence in modernity: great men have a “historical and psychological prerequisite.” Historically, there must be a time of waiting and gathering energy, as we find, for example, in the opening scene of Zarathustra. The great man and the great deed belong to a human destiny, one that emerges in situations of crisis and severe want. Psychologically, they are the effects of human energy stored and kept dormant for long periods of time in dark clouds of indifference. Primal energy gathers to a point before a cataclysmic event, like a chemical reaction with an electrical charge, unleashes some decisive, episodic force on all humanity. From here, the logic unfolds categorically: all great events, having occurred, are possibilities. All possibilities become necessities, given an infinite amount of time. Perhaps understanding this logic marks a qualitative difference in the way existence is understood. Perhaps this qualitative difference will spark the revaluation of values. When a momentous event takes place, the exception bolts from the cloud of normalcy as a point of extreme difference. In such ways, using this difference as a reference, as a “boundary-stone” on the river of eternal becoming, the meaning of the past is once again determined and the course of the future is set for a while, at least until a coming epoch unleashes the next great transvaluative event. Conditions for the occurrence of such events, and for the event of grasping this logic itself, are conceptualized, cosmologically in this reading, under the appellation “will to power.”

Before developing this reading further, it should be noted some commentators argue that the cosmological interpretation of will to power makes too strong a claim and that the extent of will to power’s domain ought to be limited to what the idea might explain as a theory of moral psychology, as the principle of an anthropology regarding the natural history of morals, or as a response to evolutionary theories placed in the service of utility. Such commentators will maintain that Nietzsche either in no way intends to construct a new meta-theory, or if he does then such intentions are mistaken and in conflict with his more prescient insights. Indeed, much evidence exists to support each of these positions. As an enthusiastic reader of the French Moralists of the eighteenth century, Nietzsche held the view that all human actions are motivated by the desire “to increase the feeling of power” (GS 13). This view seems to make Nietzsche’s insights regarding moral psychology akin to psychological egoism and would thus make doubtful the popular notion that Nietzsche advocated something like an egoistic ethic. Nevertheless, with this bit of moral psychology, a debate exists among commentators concerning whether Nietzsche intends to make dubious morality per se or whether he merely endeavors to expose those life-denying ways of moralizing inherited from the beginning of Western thought. Nietzsche, at the very least, is not concerned with divining origins. He is interested, rather, in measuring the value of what is taken as true, if such a thing can be measured. For Nietzsche, a long, murky, and thereby misunderstood history has conditioned the human animal in response to physical, psychological, and social necessities (GM II) and in ways that have created additional needs, including primarily the need to believe in a purpose for its very existence (GS 1). This ultimate need may be uncritically engaged, as happens with the incomplete nihilism of those who wish to remain in the shadow of metaphysics and with the laisser aller of the last man who overcomes dogmatism by making humanity impotent (BGE 188). On the other hand, a critical engagement with history is attempted in Nietzsche’s genealogies, which may enlighten the historical consciousness with a sort of transparency regarding the drive for truth and its consequences for determining the human condition. In the more critical engagement, Nietzsche attempts to transform the need for truth and reconstitute the truth drive in ways that are already incredulous towards the dogmatizing tendency of philosophy and thus able to withstand the new suspicions (BGE 22 and 34). Thus, the philosophical exemplar of the future stands in contrast, once again, to the uncritical man of the nineteenth century whose hidden metaphysical principles of utility and comfort fail to complete the overcoming of nihilism (Ecce Homo, “Why I am a Destiny” 4). The question of whether Nietzsche’s transformation of physical and psychological need with a doctrine of the will to power, in making an affirmative principle out of one that has dissolved the highest principles hitherto, simply replaces one metaphysical doctrine with another, or even expresses completely all that has been implicit in metaphysics per se since its inception continues to draw the interest of Nietzsche commentators today. Perhaps the radicalization of will to power in this way amounts to no more than an account of this world to the exclusion of any other. At any rate, the exemplary type, the philosophy of the future, and will to power comprise aspects of Nietzsche’s affirmative thinking. When the egoist’s “I will” becomes transparent to itself a new beginning is thereby made possible. Nietzsche thus attempts to bring forward precisely that kind of affirmation which exists in and through its own essence, insofar as will to power as a principle of affirmation is made possible by its own destructive modalities which pulls back the curtain on metaphysical illusions and dogma founded on them.

The historical situation that conditions Nietzsche’s will to power involves not only the death of God and the reappearance of pessimism, but also the nineteenth century’s increased historical awareness, and with it the return of the ancient philosophical problem of emergence. How does the exceptional, for example, begin to take shape in the ordinary, or truth in untruth, reason in un-reason, social order and law in violence, a being in becoming? The variation and formal emergence of each of these states must, according to Nietzsche, be understood as a possibility only within a presumed sphere of associated events. One could thus also speak of the “emergence,” as part of this sphere, of a given form’s disintegration. Indeed, the new cosmology must account for such a fate. Most importantly, the new cosmology must grant meaning to this eternal recurrence of emergence and disintegration without, however, taking vengeance upon it. This is to say that in the teaching of such a worldview, the “innocence of becoming” must be restored.  The problem of emergence attracted Nietzsche’s interest in the earliest writings, but he apparently began to conceptualize it in published texts during the middle period, when his work freed itself from the early period’s “metaphysics of aesthetics.” The opening passage from 1878’s Human, All Too Human gives some indication of how Nietzsche’s thinking on this ancient problem begins to take shape:

Chemistry of concepts and feelings. In almost all respects, philosophical problems today are again formulated as they were two thousand years ago: how can something arise from its opposite….? Until now, metaphysical philosophy has overcome this difficulty by denying the origin of the one from the other, and by assuming for the more highly valued things some miraculous origin…. Historical philosophy, on the other hand, the very youngest of all philosophical methods, which can no longer be even conceived of as separate from the natural sciences, has determined in isolated cases (and will probably conclude in all of them) that they are not opposites, only exaggerated to be so by the metaphysical view….As historical philosophy explains it, there exists, strictly considered, neither a selfless act nor a completely disinterested observation: both are merely sublimations. In them the basic element appears to be virtually dispersed and proves to be present only to the most careful observer. (Human, All Too Human, 1)

It is telling that Human begins by alluding to the problem of “emergence” as it is brought to light again by the “historical philosophical method.” A decidedly un-scientific “metaphysical view,” by comparison, looks rather for miraculous origins in support of the highest values. Next, in an unexpected move, Nietzsche relates the general problem of emergence to two specific issues, one concerning morals (“selfless acts”) and the other, knowledge—which is taken to include judgment (“disinterested observations”): “in them the basic element appears to be virtually dispersed” and discernable “only to the most careful observer.”

The logical structure of emergence, here, appears to have been borrowed from Hegel and, to be sure, one could point to many Hegelian traces in Nietzsche’s thought. But previously in 1874’s “On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life,” from Untimely Meditations, Nietzsche had steadfastly refuted the dialectical logic of a “world historical process,” the Absolute Idea, and cunning reason. What, then, is “the basic element”, dispersed in morals and knowledge? How is it dispersed so that only the careful observer can detect it? The most decisive moment in Nietzsche’s development of a cosmology seems to have occurred when Nietzsche plumbed the surface of his early studies on the pathos and social construction of truth to discover a more prevalent feeling, one animating all socially relevant acts. In Book One of the The Gay Science (certainly one of the greatest works in whole corpus) Nietzsche, in the role of “careful observer,” identifies, with a bit of moral psychology, the one motive spurring all such acts:

On the doctrine of the feeling of power. Benefiting and hurting others are ways of exercising one’s power upon others: that is all one desires in such cases…. Whether benefiting or hurting others involves sacrifices for us does not affect the ultimate value of our actions. Even if we offer our lives, as martyrs do for their church, this is a sacrifice that is offered for our desire for power or for the purpose of preserving our feeling of power. Those who feel “I possess Truth”—how many possessions would they not abandon in order to save this feeling!...Certainly the state in which we hurt others is rarely as agreeable, in an unadulterated way, as that in which we benefit others; it is a sign that we are still lacking power, or it shows a sense of frustration in the face of this poverty….(aphorism 13).

The “ultimate value” of our actions, even concerning those intended to pursue or preserve “truth,” are not measured by the goodness we bring others, notwithstanding the fact that intentionally harmful acts will be indicative of a desperate want of power. Nietzsche, here, asserts the significance of enhancing the feeling of power, and with this aphorism from 1882 we are on the way to seeing how “the feeling of power” will replace, for Nietzsche, otherworldly measures of value, as we read in finalized form in the second aphorism of 1888’s The Anti-Christ:

What is good?—All that heightens the feeling of power, the will to power, power itself in man. What is bad?—All that proceeds from weakness.  What is happiness?—The feeling that power increases—that a resistance is overcome.

No otherworldly measures exist, for Nietzsche. Yet, one should not conclude from this absence of a transcendental measure that all expressions of power are qualitatively the same. Certainly, the possession of a Machiavellian virtù will find many natural advantages in this world, but Nietzsche locates the most important aspect of “overcoming resistance” in self-mastery and self-commanding. In Zarathustra’s chapter, “Of Self-Overcoming,” all living creatures are said to be obeying something, while “he who cannot obey himself will be commanded. That is the nature of living creatures.” It is important to note the disjunction: one may obey oneself or one may not. Either way, one will be commanded, but the difference is qualitative. Moreover, “commanding is more difficult than obeying” (BGE 188 repeats this theme). Hence, one will take the easier path, if unable to command, choosing instead to obey the directions of another. The exception, however, will command and obey the healthy and self-mastering demands of a willing self. But why, we might ask, are all living things beholden to such commanding and obeying? Where is the proof of necessity here? Zarathustra answers:

Listen to my teaching, you wisest men! Test in earnest whether I have crept into the heart of life itself and down to the roots of its heart! Where I found a living creature, there I found will to power; and even in the will of the servant, I found the will to be master (Z “Of the Self-Overcoming”).

Here, apparently, Nietzsche’s doctrine of the feeling of power has become more than an observation on the natural history and psychology of morals. The “teaching” reaches into the heart of life, and it says something absolute about obeying and commanding. But what is being obeyed, on the cosmological level, and what is being commanded? At this point, Zarathustra passes on a secret told to him by life itself: “behold [life says], I am that which must overcome itself again and again…And you too, enlightened man, are only a path and a footstep of my will: truly, my will to power walks with the feet of your will to truth.” We see here that a principle, will to power, is embodied by the human being’s will to truth, and we may imagine it taking other forms as well. Reflecting on this insight, for example, Zarathustra claims to have solved “the riddle of the hearts” of the creator of values: “you exert power with your values and doctrines of good and evil, you assessors of values….but a mightier power and a new overcoming grow from out of your values…” That mightier power growing in and through the embodiment and expression of human values is will to power.

It is important not to disassociate will to power, as a cosmology, from the human being’s drive to create values. To be sure, Nietzsche is still saying that the creation of values expresses a desire for power, and the first essay of 1887’s On the Genealogy of Morality returns to this simple formula. Here, Nietzsche appropriates a well-known element of Hegel’s Phenomenology, the structural movement of thought between basic types called “masters and slaves.” This appropriation has the affect of emphasizing the difference between Nietzsche’s own historical “genealogies” and that of Hegel’s “dialectic” (as is worked out in Deleuze’s study of Nietzsche). Master and slave moralities, the truths of which are confirmed independently by feelings that power has been increased, are expressions of the human being’s will to power in qualitatively different states of health. The former is a consequence of strength, cheerful optimism and naiveté, while the latter stems from impotency, pessimism, cunning and, most famously, ressentiment, the creative reaction of a “bad conscience” coming to form as it turns against itself in hatred. The venom of slave morality is thus directed outwardly in ressentiment and inwardly in bad conscience. Differing concepts of “good,” moreover, belong to master and slave value systems. Master morality complements its good with the designation, “bad,” understood to be associated with the one who is inferior, weak, and cowardly. For slave morality, on the other hand, the designation, “good” is itself the complement of “evil,” the primary understanding of value in this scheme, associated with the one possessing superior strength. Thus, the “good man” in the unalloyed form of “master morality” will be the “evil man,” the man against whom ressentiment is directed, in the purest form of “slave morality.” Nietzsche is careful to add, at least in Beyond Good and Evil, that all modern value systems are constituted by compounding, in varying degrees, these two basic elements. Only a “genealogical” study of how these modern systems came to form will uncover the qualitative strengths and weaknesses of any normative judgment.

The language and method of The Genealogy hearken back to The Gay Science’s “doctrine of the feeling of power.” But, as we have seen, in the period between 1882 and 1887, and from out of the psychological-historical description of morality, truth, and the feeling of power, Nietzsche has given agency to the willing as such that lives in and through the embrace of power, and he generalizes the willing agent in order to include “life” and “the world” and the principle therein by which entities emerge embodied. The ancient philosophical problem of emergence is resolved, in part, with the cosmology of a creative, self-grounding, self-generating, sustaining and enhancing will to power. Such willing, most importantly, commands, which at the same time is an obeying: difference emerges from out of indifference and overcomes it, at least for a while. Life, in this view, is essentially self-overcoming, a self-empowering power accomplishing more power to no other end. In a notebook entry from 1885, Will to Power’s aphorism 1067, Nietzsche’s cosmological intuitions take flight:

And do you know what “the world” is to me? Shall I show it to you in my mirror? This world: a monster of energy, without beginning, without end…as force throughout, as a play of forces and waves of forces…a sea of forces flowing and rushing together, eternally changing and eternally flooding back with tremendous years of recurrence…out of the play of contradictions back to the joy of concord, still blessing itself as that which must return eternally, as a becoming that knows no satiety, no disgust, no weariness; this my Dionysian world of the eternally self-creating, the eternally self-destroying, this mystery world of the two-fold voluptuous delight, my “beyond good and evil,” without goal, unless the joy of the circle is itself a goal….This world is the will to power—and nothing besides! And you yourselves are also this will to power—and nothing besides!

Nietzsche discovers, here, the words to articulate one of his most ambitious concepts. The will to power is now described in terms of eternal and world-encompassing creativity and destructiveness, thought over the expanse of “tremendous years” and in terms of “recurrence,” what Foucault has described as the “play of domination” (1971). In some respects Nietzsche has indeed rediscovered the temporal structure of Heraclitus’ child at play, arranging toys in fanciful constructions of what merely seems like everything great and noble, before tearing down this structure and building again on the precipice of a new mishap. To live in this manner, according to Nietzsche in The Gay Science, to affirm this kind of cosmology and its form of eternity, is to “live dangerously” and to “love fate” (amor fati).

In spite of the positivistic methodology of The Genealogy, beneath the surface of this natural history of morals, will to power pumps life into the heart of both master and slave conceptual frameworks. Moreover, will to power stands as a necessary condition for all value judgments. How, one might ask, are these cosmological intuitions derived? How is knowledge of both will to power and its eternally recurring play of creation and destruction grounded? If they are to be understood poetically, then the question “why?” is misplaced (Zarathustra, “Of Poets”). Logically, with respect to knowledge, Nietzsche insists that principles of perception and judgment evolve co-dependently with consciousness, in response to physical necessities. The self is organized and brought to stand within the body and by the stimuli received there. This means that all principles are transformations of stimuli and interpretations thereupon: truth is “a mobile army of metaphors” which the body forms before the mind begins to grasp. Let us beware, Nietzsche cautions, of saying that the world possesses any sort of order or coherence without these interpretations (GS 109), even to the extent that Nietzsche himself conceives will to power as the way of all things. If all principles are interpretive gestures, by the logic of Nietzsche’s new cosmology, the will to power must also be interpretive (BGE 22). One aspect of the absence of absolute order is that interpretive gestures are necessarily called-forth for the establishment of meaning. A critical requirement of this interpretive gesture becoming transparent is that the new interpretation must knowingly affirm that all principles are grounded in interpretation. According to Nietzsche, such reflexivity does not discredit his cosmology: “so much the better,” since will to power, through Nietzsche’s articulation, emerges as the thought that now dances playfully and lingers for a while in the midst of what Vattimo might call a “weakened” (and weakening) “ontology” of indifference. The human being is thereby “an experimental animal” (GM II). Its truths have the seductive power of the feminine (BGE 1); while Nietzsche’s grandest visions are oriented by the “experimental” or “tempter” god, the one later Nietzsche comes to identify with the name Dionysus (BGE 295).

The philosopher of the future will posses a level of critical awareness hitherto unimagined, given that his interpretive gestures will be recognized as such. Yet, a flourishing life will still demand, one might imagine, being able to suspend, hide, or forget—at the right moments—the creation of values, especially the highest values. Perhaps the cartoonish, bombastic language of The Genealogy’s master and slave morality, to point to an example, which was much more soberly discussed in the previous year’s Beyond Good and Evil, is employed esoterically by Nietzsche for the rhetorical effect of producing a grand and spectacular diversion, hiding the all-important creative gesture that brought forth the new cosmology as a supreme value: “This world is the will to power and nothing besides!—And you yourselves are also this will to power--and nothing besides!” With this teaching, Nietzsche leaves underdeveloped many obvious themes, such as how the world’s non-animate matter may (or may not) be involved with will to power or whether non-human life-forms take part fully and equally in the world’s movement of forces. To have a perspective, for Nietzsche, seems sufficient for participating in will to power, but does this mean that non-human animals, which certainly seem to have perspectives, and without question participate in the living of life, have the human being’s capacity (or any capacity for that matter) to command themselves? Or, do trees and other forms of vegetation? Apparently, they do not. Such problems involve, again, the question of freedom, which interests Nietzsche primarily in the positive form. Of more importance to Nietzsche is that which pertains solely to the human being’s marshalling of forces but, even here (or perhaps especially here), a hierarchy of differences may be discerned. Some human forms of participation in will to power are noble, others ignoble. But, concerning these sorts of activities, Nietzsche stresses in Beyond Good and Evil (aphorism 9) the difference between his own cosmology, which at times seems to re-establish the place of nobility in nature, and the “stoic” view, which asserts the oneness of humanity with divine nature:

“According to nature” you want to live? Oh you noble Stoics, what deceptive words these are! Imagine a being like nature, wasteful beyond measure, indifferent beyond measure, without purposes and consideration, without mercy and justice, fertile and desolate and uncertain at the same time; imagine indifference itself as a power—how could you live according to this indifference? Living—is that not precisely wanting to be other than this nature? Is not livingestimating, preferring, being unjust, being limited, wanting to be different? ….But this is an ancient, eternal story: what formerly happened with the Stoics still happens today, too, as soon as any philosophy begins to believe in itself. It always creates the world in its own image; it cannot do otherwise. Philosophy is this tyrannical drive itself; the most spiritual will to power, to the “creation of  the world,” to the causa prima.

Strauss claims that here Nietzsche is replacing “divine nature” and its egalitarian coherence with “noble nature” and its expression of hierarchies, the condition for which is difference, per se, emerging in nature from indifference (1983). Other commentators have suggested that Nietzsche, here, betrays all of philosophy, lacking any sense of decency with this daring expose—that what is left after the expression of such a forbidden truth is no recourse to meaning.

The most generalized form of the philosophical problem of emergence and disintegration, of the living, valuing, wanting to be different, willing power, is described here in terms of the difference-creating gesture embodied by the human being’s essential work, its “creation of the world” and first causes. Within nature, one might say, energy disperses and accumulates in various force-points: nature’s power to create these force-points is radically indifferent, and this indifference towards what has been created also characterizes its power. Periodically, something exceptional is thrust out from its opposite, given that radical indifference is indifferent even towards itself (if one could speak of ontological conditions in such a representative tone, which Nietzsche certainly does from time to time). Nature is disturbed, and the human being, having thus become aware of its own identity and of others, works towards preserving itself by tying things down with definitions; enhancing itself, occasionally, by loosening the fetters of old, worn-out forms; creating and destroying in such patterns, so as to make humanity and even nature appear to conform to some bit of tyranny. From within the logic of will to power, narrowly construed, human meaning is thus affirmed. “But to what end?” one might ask. To no end, Nietzsche would answer. Here, the more circumspect view could be taken, as is found in Twilight of the Idol’s “The Four Great Errors”: “One is a piece of fate, one belongs to the whole, one is in the whole, there exist nothing which could judge, measure, compare, condemn our being, for that would be to judge, measure, compare, condemn the whole….But nothing exists apart from the whole!” Nietzsche conceptualizes human fate, then, in his most extreme vision of will to power, as being fitted to a whole, “the world,” which is itself “nothing besides” a “monster of energy, without beginning, without end…eternally changing and eternally flooding back with tremendous years of recurrence.” In such manner, will to power expresses itself not only through the embodiment of humanity, its exemplars, and the constant revaluation of values, but also in time. Dasein, for Nietzsche, is suspended on the cross between these ontological movements—between an in/different playing of destruction/creation—and time. But, what temporal model yields the possibility for these expressions? How does Nietzsche’s experimental philosophy conceptualize time?

7. Eternal Recurrence

The world’s eternally self-creating, self-destroying play is conditioned by time. Yet, Nietzsche’s skepticism concerning what can be known of telos, indeed his refutation of an absolute telos independent of human fabrication, demands a view of time that differs from those that place willing, purposiveness, and efficient causes in the service of goals, sufficient reason, and causa prima. Another formulation of this problem might ask, “what is the history of willing, if not the demonstration of progress and/or decay?”

Nietzsche’s solution to the riddle of time, nevertheless, radicalizes the Christian concept of eternity, combining a bit of simple observation and sure reasoning with an intuition that produces curious, but innovative results. The solution takes shape as Nietzsche fills the temporal horizons of past and future with events whose denotations have no permanent tether. Will to power, the Heraclitean cosmic-child, plays-on without preference to outcomes. Within the two-fold limit of this horizon, disturbances emerge from their opposites, but one cannot evaluate them, absolutely, because judgment implicates participation in will to power, in the ebb and flow of events constituting time. The objective perspective is not possible, since the whole consumes all possibilities, giving form to and destroying all that has come to fulfillment. Whatever stands in this flux, does so in the midst of the whole, but only for a while. It disturbs the whole, but does so as part of the whole. As such, whatever stands is measured, on the one hand, by the context its emergence creates. On the other hand, whatever stands is immeasurable, by virtue of the whole, the logic of which would determine this moment to have occurred in the never-ending flux of creation and destruction. Even to say that particular events seem better or worse suited to the functionality of the whole, or to its stability, or its health, or that an event may be measured absolutely by its fitted-ness in some other way, presupposes a standpoint that Nietzsche’s cosmology will not allow. One is left only to describe material occurrences and to intuit the passing of time.

The second part of Nietzsche’s solution to the riddle of time reasons that the mere observation of an occurrence, whether thought to be a simple thing or a more complex event, is enough to demonstrate the occurrence’s possibility. If “something” has happened, then its happening, naturally, must have been possible. Each simple thing or complex event is linked, inextricably, to a near infinite number of others, also demonstrating the possibilities of their happenings. If all of these possibilities could be presented in such a way as to account for their relationships and probabilities, as for example on a marvelously complex set of dice, then it could be shown that each of these possibilities will necessarily occur, and re-occur, given that the game of dice continues a sufficient length of time.

Next, Nietzsche considers the nature of temporal limits and duration. He proposes that no beginning or end of time can be determined, absolutely, in thought. No matter what sort of temporal limits are set by the imagination, questions concerning what lies beyond these limits never demonstrably cease. The question, “what precedes or follows the imagined limits of past and future?” never contradicts our understanding of time, which is thus shown to be more culturally and historically determined than otherwise admitted.

Finally, rather than to imagine a past and future extended infinitely on a plane of sequential moments, or to imagine a time in which nothing happens or will happen, Nietzsche envisions connecting what lies beyond the imagination’s two temporal horizons, so that time is represented in the image of a circle, through which a colossal, but definitive number of possibilities are expressed. Time is infinite with this model, but filled by a finite number of material possibilities, recurring eternally in the never-ending play of the great cosmic game of chance.

What intuition led Nietzsche to interpret the cosmos as having no inherent meaning, as if it were playing itself out and repeating itself in eternally recurring cycles, in the endless creation and destruction of force-points without purpose? How does this curious temporal model relate to the living of life?  In his philosophical autobiography, Ecce Homo, Nietzsche grounds eternal recurrence in his own experiences by relating an anecdote regarding, supposedly, its first appearance to him in thought. One day, Nietzsche writes, while hiking around Lake Silvaplana near Sils Maria, he came upon a giant boulder, took out a piece of paper and scribbled, “6000 Fuss jenseits von Mensch und Zeit.” From here, Nietzsche goes on to articulate “the eternal recurrence of the same,” which he then characterizes as “a doctrine” or “a teaching” of the “highest form of affirmation that can possibly be attained.”

It is important to note that at the time of this discovery, Nietzsche was bringing his work on The Gay Science to a close and beginning to sketch out a plan for Zarathustra. The conceptualization of eternal recurrence emerges at the threshold of Nietzsche’s most acute positivistic inquiry and his most poetic creation. The transition between the two texts is made explicit when Nietzsche repeats the final aphorism of The Gay Science’s Book IV in the opening scene of Zarathustra’s prelude. The repetition of this scene will prove to be no coincidence, given the importance Nietzsche places upon the theme of recurrence in Zarathustra’s climactic chapters. Moreover, in the penultimate aphorism of The Gay Science, as a sort of introduction to that text’s Zarathustra scene (which itself would seem quite odd apart from the later work), Nietzsche first lays out Zarathustra’s central teaching, the idea of eternal recurrence.

The greatest weight.—What, if some day or night a demon were to steal after you into your loneliest loneliness and say to you: “This life as you now live it and have lived it, you will have to live once more and innumerable times more; and there will be nothing new in it, but every pain and every joy and every thought and sigh and everything unutterably small or great in your life will have to return to you, all in the same succession and sequence—even this spider and this moonlight between the trees, and even this moment and I myself. The eternal hourglass of existence is turned upside down again and again, and you with it, speck of dust!” (GS 341).

“What if,” wonders Nietzsche, the thought took hold of us? Here, the conceptualization of eternal recurrence, thus, coincides with questions regarding its impact: “how well disposed would you have to become to yourself and to life to crave nothing more fervently than this ultimate eternal confirmation and seal?”

How would the logic of this new temporal model alter our experiences of factual life? Would such a thought diminish the willfulness of those who grasp it? Would it diminish our willingness to make normative decisions? Would willing cease under the pessimistic suspicion that the course for everything has already been determined, that all intentions are “in vain”? What would we lose by accepting the doctrine of this teaching? What would we gain? It seems strange that Nietzsche would place so much dramatic emphasis on this temporal form of determinism. If all of our worldly strivings and cravings were revealed, in the logic of eternal recurrence, to be no more than illusions, if every contingent fact of creation and destruction were understood to have merely repeated itself without end, if everything that happens, as it happens, both re-inscribes and anticipates its own eternal recurrence, what would be the affect on our dispositions, on our capacities to strive and create? Would we be crushed by this eternal comedy? Or, could we somehow find it liberating?

Even though Nietzsche has envisioned a temporal model of existence seemingly depriving us of the freedom to act in unique ways, we should not fail to catch sight of the qualitative differences the doctrine nevertheless leaves open for the living. The logic of eternity determines every contingent fact in each cycle of recurrence. That is, each recurrence is quantitatively the same. The quality of that recurrence, however, seems to remain an open question. What if the thought took hold of us? If we indeed understood ourselves to be bound by fate and thus having no freedom from the eternal logic of things, could we yet summon love for that fate, to embrace a kind of freedom for becoming that person we are? This is the strange confluence of possibility and necessity that Nietzsche announces in the beginning of Gay Science’s Book IV, with the concept of Amor fati: “I want to learn more and more to see as beautiful what is necessary in things; then I shall be one of those who make things beautiful. Amor fati: let that be my love henceforth!”

Responses to this “doctrine” have been varied. Even some of the most enthusiastic Nietzsche commentators have, like Kaufmann, deemed it unworthy of serious reflection. Nietzsche, however, appears to stress its significance in Twilight of the Idols and Ecce Homo by emphasizing Zarathustra’s importance in the “history of humanity” and by dramatically staging in Thus Spoke Zarathustra the idea of eternal recurrence as the fundamental teaching of the main character. The presentation of this idea, however, leaves room for much doubt concerning the literal meaning of these claims, as does the paucity of direct references to the doctrine in other works intended for publication. In Nietzsche’s Nachlass, we discover attempts to work out rational proofs supporting the theory, but they seem to present no serious challenge to a linear conception of time. Among commentators taking the doctrine seriously, Löwith takes it as a supplement to Nietzsche’s historical nihilism, as a way of placing emphasis on the problem of meaning in history after the shadows of God have been dissolved. For Löwith’s Nietzsche, nihilism is more than an historical moment giving rise to a crisis of confidence or faith. Rather, nihilism is the essence of Nietzsche’s thought, and it poses the sorts of problems that lead Nietzsche into formulating eternal return as a way of restoring meaning in history. For Löwith, then, eternal return is inextricably linked to historical nihilism and offers both cosmological and anthropological grounds for accepting imperatives of self-overcoming. Yet, this grand attempt fails to restore meaning after the death of God, according to Löwith, because of eternal return’s logical contradictions.

8. Reception of Nietzsche’s Thought

The reception of Nietzsche’s work, on all levels of engagement, has been complicated by historical contingencies that are related only by accident to the thought itself. The first of these complications pertains to the editorial control gained by Elizabeth in the aftermath of her brother’s mental and physical collapse. Elisabeth’s overall impact on her brother’s reputation is generally thought to be very problematic. Her husband, Bernhard Förster, whom Friedrich detested, was a leader of the late nineteenth-century German anti-Semitic political movement, which Friedrich often ridiculed and unambiguously condemned, both in his published works and in private correspondences. On this issue, Yovel demonstrates persuasively, with a contextual analysis of letters, materials from the Nachlass, and published works, that Nietzsche developed an attitude of “anti-anti-Semitism” after overcoming the culture of prejudice that formed him in his youth (Yovel, 1998). In the mid-1880s, Förster and wife led a small group of colonists to Paraguay in hopes of establishing an idyllic, racially pure, German settlement. The colony foundered, Bernhard committed suicide, and Elisabeth returned home, just in time to find her brother’s health failing and his literary career ready to soar.

Upon her return, Elisabeth devised a way to keep alive the memory of both husband and brother, legally changing her last name to “Förster-Nietzsche,” a gesture indicative of designs to associate the philosopher with a political ideology he loathed. The stain of Elisabeth’s editorial imprint can be seen on the many ill-informed and haphazard interpretations of Nietzsche produced in the early part of the twentieth century, the unfortunate traces of which remain in some readings today. During the 1930s, in the midst of intense activity by National Socialist academic propagandists such as Alfred Bäumler, even typically insightful thinkers such as Emmanuel Levinas confused the public image of Nietzsche for the philosopher’s stated beliefs. Counter-efforts in the 1930s to refute such propaganda, and the popular misconceptions it was fomenting at the time, can be found both inside and outside Germany, in seminars, for example, led by Karl Jaspers and Karl Löwith, and in Georges Bataille’s essay “Nietzsche and the Fascists.” Of course, the ad hominem argument that “Nietzsche must be a Fascist philosopher because the Fascists venerated him as one of their own,” may be ignored. (No one should find Kant’s moral philosophy reprehensible, by comparison, simply on the grounds that Eichmann attempted to exploit it in a Jerusalem court). Apart from the fallacy, here, even the premise itself regarding Nietzsche and the Fascists is not entirely above reproach, since some Fascists were skeptical of the commensurability of Nietzsche’s thought with their political aims. The stronger claim that Nietzsche’s thought leads to National Socialism is even more problematic. Nevertheless, intellectual histories pursuing the question of how Nietzsche has been placed into the service of all sorts of political interests are an important part of Nietzsche scholarship.

Since the middle part of the last century, Nietzsche scholars have come to grips with the role played by Elisabeth and her associates in obscuring Nietzsche’s anti-Nationalistic, anti-Socialist, anti-German views, his pan-European advocacy of race mixing, as well as his hatred for anti-Semitism and its place in the late-nineteenth-century politics of exploitation. The work Elisabeth performed as her brother’s publicist, however, undoubtedly fulfilled all of her own fantasies: in the early 1930’s, decades after Friedrich’s death, the Nietzsche-Archiv was visited, ceremoniously, by Adolf Hitler, who was greeted and entertained by Elisabeth (in perhaps the most symbolic gesture of her association with the Nietzsche image) with a public reading of the work of her late husband, Bernhard, the anti-Semite. Hitler later attended Elisabeth’s funeral as Chancellor of Germany.

In a matter related to Elizabeth’s impact on the reception of her brother’s thought, the relevance of Nietzsche’s biography to his philosophical work has long been a point of contention among Nietzsche commentators. While an exhaustive survey of the way this key issue has been addressed in the scholarship would be difficult in this context, a few influential readings may be briefly mentioned. Among notable German readers, Heidegger and Fink dismiss the idea that Nietzsche’s thought can be elucidated with the details of his life, while Jaspers affirms the “exceptional” nature of Nietzsche’s life and identifies the exception as a key aspect of his philosophy. French readers such as Bataille, Deleuze, Klossowski, Foucault, and Derrida assert the relevance of various biographical details to specific movements within Nietzsche’s writings. In the United States, the influential reading of Walter Kaufman follows Heidegger, for the most part, in denying relevance, while his student, Alexander Nehamas, tends the other way, linking Nietzsche’s various literary styles to his “perspectivism” and ultimately to living, per se, as an self-interpretive gesture. However difficult it might be to see the philosophical relevance of various biographical curiosities, such as Nietzsche’s psychological development as a child without a living father, his fascination and then fallout with Wagner, his professional ostracism, his thwarted love life, the excruciating physical ailments that tormented him, and so on, it would also seem capricious and otherwise inconsistent with Nietzsche’s work to radically severe his thought from these and other biographical details, and persuasive interpretations have argued that such experiences, and Nietzsche’s well-considered views of them, are inseparable from the multiple trajectories of his intellectual work.

Attempts to isolate Nietzsche’s philosophy from the twists and turns of a frequently problematic life may be explained, in part, as a reaction to several early, and rather detrimental, popular-psychological studies attempting to explain the work in a reductive and decidedly un-philosophical manner. Such was the reading proffered, for example, by Lou Salomè, a woman with whom Nietzsche briefly had an unconventional and famously complex romantic relationship, and who later befriended Sigmund Freud among other leaders of European culture at the fin-de-siècle. Salomè’s Friedrich Nietzsche in His Works (1894) helped cast the image of Nietzsche as a lonely, miserable, self-immolating, recluse whose “external intellectual work…and inner life coalesce completely.” In some commentaries, this image prevails yet today, but its accuracy is also a matter of debate. Nietzsche had many casual associates and a few close friends while in school and as a professor in Basel. Even during the period of his most intense intellectual activity, after withdrawing from the professional world of the academy and, like Marx and others before him in the nineteenth century, taking up the wandering life of a “good European,” the many written correspondences between Nietzsche and life-long friends, along with what is known about the minor details of his daily habits, his days spent in the company of fellow lodgers and travelers, taking meals regularly (in spite of a very closely regulated diet), and similar anecdotes, all put forward a different image. No doubt the affair with Salomè and their mutual friend, the philosopher Paul Rée, left Nietzsche embittered towards the two of them, and it seems likely that this bitterness clouded Salomè’s interpretation of Nietzsche and his works. Elisabeth, who had always loathed Salomè for her immoderation and perceived influence over Friedrich, attempted to correct her rival’s account by writing her own biography of Friedrich, which was effusive in its praise but did little to advance the understanding of Nietzsche’s thought. Perhaps these kinds of problems, then, provide the best argument for resisting the lure to reduce interpretations of Nietzsche’s thought to gossipy biographical anecdotes and clumsy, amateurish speculation, even if the other extreme has also been excessive at times.

Another key issue in the reception of Nietzsche’s work involves determining its relationship to the thoughts of other philosophers and, indeed, to the philosophical tradition itself. On both levels of this complex issue, the work of Martin Heidegger looms paramount. Heidegger began working closely with Nietzsche’s thought in the 1930s, a time rife with political opportunism in Germany, even among scholars and intellectuals. In the midst of a struggle over the official Nazi interpretation of Nietzsche, Heidegger’s views began to coalesce, and after a series of lectures on Nietzsche’s thought in the late 1930’s and 1940, Heidegger produces in 1943 the seminal essay, “Nietzsche’s Word: “God is Dead””.  Nietzsche, for Heidegger, brought “the consummation of metaphysics” in the age of subject-centered reasoning, industrialization, technological power, and the “enframing” (Ge-stell) of humans and all other beings as a “standing reserve.” Combining Nietzsche’s self-described “inversion of Platonism” with the emphasis Nietzsche had undoubtedly placed upon the value-positing act and its relatedness to subjective or inter-subjective human perspectives, Heidegger dubbed Nietzsche “the last metaphysician” and tied him to the logic of a historical narrative highlighted by the appearances of Plato, Aristotle, Roman Antiquity, Christendom, Luther, Descartes, Leibniz, Schopenhauer, and others. The “one thought” common to each of these movements and thinkers, according to Heidegger, and the path Nietzsche thus thinks through to its “consummation,” is the “metaphysical” determination of being (Sein) as no more than something static and constantly present. Although Nietzsche appears to reject the concept of being as an “empty fiction” (claiming, in Twilight of the Idols, to concur with Heraclitus in this regard), Heidegger nevertheless reads in Nietzsche’s Platonic inversion the most insidious form of the metaphysics of presence, in which the destruction and re-establishment of value is taken to be the only possible occasion for philosophical labor whereby the very question of being is completely obliterated. Within this diminution of thought, the Nietzschean “Superman” emerges supremely powerful and triumphant, taking dominion over the earth and all of its beings, measured only by the mundane search for advantages in the ubiquitous struggle for preservation and enhancement.

As is typically the case with Heidegger’s interpretations of the history of philosophy, many aspects of this reading are truly remarkable—Heidegger’s scholarship, for example, his feel for what is important to Nietzsche, and his elaboration of Nietzsche’s work in a way that seems compatible with a narrative of the concealing and revealing destiny of being. However, the plausibility of this reading has come into question almost from the moment the full extent of it was made known in the 1950s and 60s. In Germany, for example, Eugen Fink concludes his 1960 study of Nietzsche by casting doubt upon Heidegger’s claim that Nietzsche’s thought can be reduced to a metaphysics:

Heidegger’s Nietzsche interpretation is essentially based upon  Heidegger’s summary and insight into the history of being and in particular on his interpretation of the metaphysics of modernity. Nevertheless, the question remains open whether Nietzsche does not already leave the metaphysical dimensions of any problems essentially and intentionally behind in his conception of the cosmos. There is a non-metaphysical originality in his cosmological philosophy of “play.” Even the early writings indicate the mysterious dimension of play….

Fink’s reluctance to take a stronger position against the reading of his renowned teacher seems rather coy, given that Fink’s study, throughout, has stressed the meaning and importance of “cosmological play” in Nietzsche’s work. Other commentators have much more explicitly challenged Heidegger’s grand narrative and specifically its place for Nietzsche in the Western tradition, concurring with Fink that Nietzsche’s conceptualization of play frees his thought from the tradition of metaphysics, or that Nietzsche, purposively or not, offered conflicting views of himself, eluding the kind of summary treatment presented by Heidegger and much less-gifted readers (who consider Nietzsche to be no more than a late-Romantic, a social-Darwinist, or the like). In this sort of commentary, Nietzsche’s work itself is at play in deconstructing the all-too-rigid kinds of explanations.

While such a reading has proven to be popular, partly because it seems to make room for various points of entry into Nietzsche’s thought, it has understandably stirred a backlash of sorts among less charitable commentators who find pragmatic or neo-Kantian strains in Nietzsche’s critique of metaphysics and who wish to separate Nietzsche’s level-headed philosophy from his poorly-developed musings. Notable works by Schacht, Clark, Conway, and Leiter fall into this category. In a loosely related movement, many commentators bring Nietzsche into dialogue with the tradition by concentrating on aspects of his work relevant to particular philosophical issues, such as the problem of truth, the development of a natural history of morals, a philosophical consideration of moral psychology, problems concerning subjectivity and logo-centrism, theories of language, and many others. Finally, much work continues to be done on Nietzsche in the history of ideas, regarding, for example, Nietzsche’s philology, his intellectual encounters with nineteenth-century science; the neo-Kantians; the pre-Socratics (or “pre-Platonics,” as he called them); the work of his friend, Paul Rée; their shared affinity for the wit and style of La Rochefoucauld; historical affinities and influences such as those pertaining to Hölderlin, Goethe, Emerson, and Lange, detailed studies of what Nietzsche was reading and when he was reading it, and a host of other themes. Works by Habermas, Porter, Gillespie, Brobjer, Ansell-Pearson, Conway, and Strong are notable for historicizing Nietzsche in a variety of contexts.

The Anglo-American reception of Nietzsche is typically suspicious of Heidegger’s influence and strongly disapproves of gestures linking the “New Nietzsche” found in late twentieth-century discussions of postmodernism and literary criticism to a supposed end of philosophy, although some American scholars will admit, with Gillespie, that “the core of this postmodern reading cannot simply be dismissed,” despite this reading’s excesses (1995, 177). Due to these suspicions, moreover, common Nietzschean themes such as historical nihilism, Dionysianism, tragedy, and play, as well as cosmological readings of will to power, and eternal recurrence are downplayed in Anglo-American treatments, in favor of bringing out more traditional sorts of philosophical problems such as truth and knowledge, values and morality, and human consciousness. Nietzsche reception in the United States has been determined by a unique set of circumstances, as portrayed by Schacht (1995) and others. A very early stage of that reception is stained by the Nazi-misappropriation of Nietzsche, which popular American audiences were prepared to accept uncritically due on the one hand to their initial impression of Nietzsche as an enemy of Christianity who ultimately went insane and on the other hand to their lack of familiarity with Nietzsche’s work. The next stage of Nietzsche reception in the U.S. benefited greatly from Walter Kaufmann’s landmark treatment in the 1950’s. Kaufmann’s Nietzsche was certainly no fascist. Rather, he was a secular humanist and a forerunner of the existentialist movement enjoying a measure of popularity (and acceptability) on college campuses in the United States during the 1950’s and 1960’s. Whereas European commentators such as Jaspers, Löwith, Bataille, and even Heidegger had been busy in the 1930’s “marshalling” Nietzsche (as Jaspers described it) against the National Socialists, in the U.S. it was left to Kaufmann and others in the 1950’s to successfully refute the image of Nietzsche as a Nazi-prototype. So successful was Kaufmann in this regard, that Anglo-American readers had difficulty seeing Nietzsche in any other light, and philosophers who found existentialism shallow regarded Nietzsche with the same disdain. This image of Nietzsche was corrected, somewhat, by Danto’s Nietzsche as Philosopher, which attempted to cast Nietzsche as a forerunner to analytic philosophy, although doubts about Nietzsche’s suitability for this role surely remain even today. To the extent that Danto succeeded in the 1970’s in reshaping philosophical discussions regarding Nietzsche, a new difficulty emerged, related generally to a tension in the world of Anglo-American philosophy between Analytic and Continental approaches to the discipline. In such a light, Schacht sees his work on Nietzsche as an attempt to bridge this institutional divide, as do other Anglo-American readers. The work of Rorty may certainly be characterized in this manner. Despite these attempts, tensions remain between Anglo-American readers who cultivate a neo-pragmatic version of Nietzsche and those who, by comparison, seem too comfortable accepting uncritically the problematic aspects of the Continental interpretation.

In most cases, interpretations of Nietzsche’s thought, and what is taken to be most significant about it, when not directed solely by external considerations, will be determined by the texts in Nietzsche’s corpus given priority and by a decision regarding Nietzsche’s overall coherence, as concerns any given issue, throughout the trajectory of his intellectual development.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Nietzsche’s Collected Works in German

  • Samtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, 15 vols (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1980).
    • This “critical student edition” of collected works, commonly referenced as the KSA, contains Nietzsche’s major writings and most of the well-known essays and aphorisms found in his journals. Specialists and readers seeking Nietzsche’s letters, his lectures at Basel, and other writings from his vast Nachlass, will need to supplement the KSA with two additional sources.
  • Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Briefwechsel, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, 24 vols. (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1975-84).
    • This edition offers a comprehensive collection of Nietzsche’s correspondences.
  • Kritische Gesamtausgabe: Werke, ed. Giorgio Colli and Mazzino Montinari, (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1967-).
    • The project of publishing a “complete edition” of Nietzsche’s writings was started in 1967 by Colli and Montinari and has since enlisted the services of a number of other editors. At the present time, the project remains unfinished. The most important contribution of the KGW, as this edition is commonly referenced, is perhaps its publication of Nietzsche’s lectures from the University of Basel on topics such as pre-Platonic philosophy, the Platonic dialogues, and ancient rhetoric.

b. Nietzsche’s Major Works Available in English

Most of Nietzsche’s major works were published during his lifetime and are now available to English readers in competing translations. The following list is by no means exhaustive.

  • The Birth of Tragedy (Die Geburt der Tragödie,1872); published in English with The Case of Wagner (Der Fall Wagner, 1888), trans. Walter Kaufmann, (New York: Vintage, 1966).
    • These two texts are available separately in other editions
  • Untimely Meditations (Unzeitgemässe Betrachtungen, 1873-1876), trans. R.J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983).
    • The four essays of this work are available separately in other editions
  • Human, All Too Human (Menschliches, Allzumenschliches [vol. 1], 1878 and [vol. 2], 1879-1880), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986).
    • Volume one of this work and the two distinct parts of volume two, “Assorted Maxims and Aphorisms” and “The Wanderer and His Shadow,” are available separately in other editions.
  • Daybreak (Morgenröte, 1881), trans. R, J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
    • The later editions of this translation contain a helpful index.
  • The Gay Science (Die fröliche Wissenschaft, 1882; with important supplements to the second edition, 1887), trans. Walter Kaufman (New York: Vintage, 1974).
  • Thus Spoke Zarathustra (Also Sprach Zarathustra, bks I-II, 1883; bk III, 1884; bk IV [printed and distributed privately], 1885), trans. R. J. Hollingdale, (New York: Penguin, 1973).
  • Beyond Good and Evil (Jenseits von Gut und Böse, 1886), trans. Walter Kaufman (New York: Vintage, 1966).
  • On the Genealogy of Morality (Zur Genealogie der Moral, 1887), edited with important supplements from the Nachlass and other works by Keith Ansell-Pearson; trans. Carol Diethe (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995).
  • The Case of Wagner (Der Fall Wagner, 1888); published in English with The Birth of Tragedy (Die Geburt der Tragödie,1872), trans. Walter Kaufmann, (New York: Vintage, 1966)
  • Ecce Homo (Ecce Homo, 1888, first published 1908), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Penguin, 1992).
  • Nietzsche contra Wagner (Nietzsche contra Wagner, 1888, first published 1895), trans. Walter Kaufmann, in The Portable Nietzsche, ed. Walter Kaufmann (New York: Viking, 1954).
  • Twilight of the Idols (Götzen-Dämmerung, 1889); published in English with The Anti-Christ (Der Antichrist, 1888), trans. R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Penguin, 1968).

c. Important Works Available in English from Nietzsche’s Nachlass

Nietzsche’s Nachlass contains several developed essays and an overwhelming number of fragments, sketches of outlines, and aphorisms, some in thematically related successions. A number of these writings are available to English readers, and a few are accessible in a variety of editions, either as supplements to the major works or as part of assorted critical editions. The following list offers a sample of these writings.

  • “Homer on Competition” (“Homers Wettkampf,” 1872) and “The Greek State” (Der griechische Staat, 1872), included in On the Genealogy of Morality (Zur Genealogie der Moral, 1887), ed. Keith Ansell-Pearson; trans. Carol Diethe (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995).
  • “On Truth and Lies in a Nonmoral Sense” (“Über Wahrheit und Lüge im aussermoralischen Sinne,” 1873), collected in various editions, including Philosophy and Truth: Selections from Nietzsche’s Notebooks of the early 1870’s, ed. and trans. Daniel Breazeale (New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1979) and Friedrich Nietzsche on Rhetoric and Language, ed. and trans. Sander L. Gilman, Carole Blair, and David J. Parent (New York: Oxford University Press, 1989).
  • Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (Die Philosophie im tragischen Zeitalter der Griechen, 1873), trans. Marianne Cowan (Washington, D. C.: Gateway Editions, 1962).
  • The Pre-Platonic Philosophers (Die vorplatonischen Philosophen, lectures during various semesters at Basel from 1869 to 1876; ed. by Fritz Bornmann and Mario Carpitella for the KGW, vol. II, part 4), ed. and trans. with an interpretive essay and appendix by Greg Whitlock (Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2001).
  • Unpublished Writings from the Period of Unfashionable Observations (vol. 11 of The Completed Works of Friedrich Nietzsche), based on the KGW, adapted by Ernst Behler; ed. Bernd Magnus; trans. Richard T. Gray (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1999).
  • The Will to Power (Der Wille zur Macht, writings from the Nachlass ed. and arranged by Elizabeth Förster-Nietzsche and Peter Gast and published in various forms after Nietzsche’s death), trans. Walter Kaufmann and R. J. Hollingdale (New York: Vintage, 1967).
  • Writings from the Late Notebooks (writings from the Nachlass), ed. Rüdigger Bittner; trans. Kate Sturge (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).

d. Biographies

A firsthand and secondhand biographical narrative may be followed in the collected letters of Nietzsche and his associates:

  • Selected Letters of Friedrich Nietzsche, ed. Christopher Middleton (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1996)
  • Conversations with Nietzsche: A Life in the Words of His Contemporaries, ed. Sander L. Gilman, trans. David J. Parent (New York: Oxford University Press, 1987).

The following list includes a few of the most well known biographies in English.

  • Diethe, Carol. Nietzsche’s Sister and the Will to Power: A Biography of Elisabeth Förster-Nietzsche (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2003).
  • Hayman, Ronald. Nietzsche: A Critical Life (New York: Oxford University Press, 1980).
  • Hollingdale, R. J. Nietzsche, the Man and His Philosophy (Baton Rouge: Louisiana State University Press, 1965).
  • Pletsch, Carl. Young Nietzsche: Becoming a Genius (New York: The Free Press, 1991).
  • Safranski, Rüdiger. Nietzsche: Biographie Seines Denkens (Muenchen: Carl Hanser, 2000).
  • Nietzsche: A Philosophical Biography, trans. Shelley Frisch (New York: Norton, 2002).
  • Salomé, Lou. Nietzsche, ed. and trans. Siegfried Mandel (Redding Ridge, CT: Black Swan, 1988).

e. Commentaries and Scholarly Researches

Hollingdale once wrote that Nietzsche anticipated what would soon become “part of the consciousness of every thinking person” living in the twentieth century and, no doubt, beyond. During the last forty years, Nietzsche scholarship has generated a considerable amount of commentary and research, and some of the most important of these texts were produced by the twentieth century’s most significant thinkers. Even so, the work of elucidating Nietzsche’s thought seems unfinished. The following list is by no means comprehensive, nor does it purport to represent all of the major themes prevalent in Nietzsche scholarship today. It is designed for the reader seeking to learn more about the intellectual history of Nietzsche reception in the twentieth century.

  • Allison, David B. ed.,  The New Nietzsche: Contemporary Styles of Interpretation, (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1985).
  • Allison, David B. Reading the New Nietzsche (Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2001).
  • Ansell-Pearson, Keith. An Introduction to Nietzsche as Political Thinker (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
  • Aschheim, Steven E. The Nietzsche Legacy in Germany: 1890-1990 (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1994).
  • Bambach, Charles R. Heidegger’s Roots: Nietzsche, National Socialism, and the Greeks (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2003).
    • This text delivers a scholarly, critical account of Heidegger’s intellectual encounter with Nietzsche against the politically charged backdrop of Germany in the 1930s.
  • Bataille, Georges. Sur Nietzsche (Paris, Gallimard, 1945), available in English under the title, On Nietzsche, trans. Bruce Boon (New York: Paragon House, 1992).
  • Bataille, Georges. “Nietzsche and the Fascists,” available in Visions of Excess: Selected Writings, 1927-1939 (which includes other essays devoted to Nietzsche), ed. Allan Stoekl, trans. Stoekl, et. al (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1985).
  • Brobjer, Thomas. Nietzsche’s Philosophical Context: An Intellectual Biography (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2008).
    • Brobjer delivers invaluable resource for collating Nietzsche’s writings with the texts that he was himself reading.
  • Clark, Maudemarie. Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
    • This study is representative of the trend in American scholarship emphasizing those parts of Nietzsche’s thought apparently commensurate with pragmatic and neo-Kantian concerns. It is, perhaps, the best point of entry for readers hoping to gain such insight. For Clark, many of Nietzsche’s remarks on truth are simply confused, although he is redeemed as a philosopher by conclusions drawn in 1887 and thereafter.
  • Conway, Daniel W. Nietzsche's Dangerous Game: Philosophy in the Twilight of the Idols (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002).
  • Conway, Daniel W. Nietzsche and the Political (London: Routledge, 1997).
  • Danto, Authur C. Nietzsche as Philosopher (New York: Columbia University Press, 1965).
    • According to Danto, a surprisingly rigorous analytic system of thought is embedded in Nietzsche’s writings, which for Danto are rather poorly executed from a philosophical perspective. In this reading, Nietzsche’s architectonic shortcomings are redeemed, even unconsciously, by the consistency of his polemics.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Nietzsche et la philosophie, (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1962), available in English under the title, Nietzsche and Philosophy, trans. Hugh Thomlinson (New York: Columbia University Press, 1983).
    • Deleuze’s seminal work delivers the classic statement on Nietzsche as a thinker of processes and relations of active and reactive forces. For Deleuze, Nietzsche is a post-Kantian thinker of historical consciousness and a genealogist refuting the dialectic rationalism of Hegel
  • Derrida, Jacques. Spurs: Nietzsche’s Styles (Èperons: Les Styles de Nietzsche), published with French and English facing pages, trans. Barbara Harlow (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1979).
  • Derrida, Jacques . “Interpreting Signatures (Nietzsche/Heidegger): Two Questions,” trans. Diane P. Michelfelder and Richard E. Palmer in Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989).
  • Fink, Eugen. Nietzsches Philosophie (Stuttgart: Kohlhammer, 1960); available in English under the title, Nietzsche’s Philosophy, trans. Goetz Richter (London: Continuum, 2003).
  • Foucault, Michel. “Nietzsche, la généalogie, l’historiè,” in Hommage à Jean Hyppolite (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1971), available in English under the title, “Nietzsche, Genealogy, History,” trans. Donald F. Bouchard and Sherry Simon in The Foucault Reader, ed. Paul Rabinow (New York: Pantheon Books, 1984), 76-100.
    • According to Foucault, Nietzsche’s genealogies eschew the search for origins and teleology with the result of uncovering simply the “play of dominations” in history.
  • Gillespie, Michael Allen. Nihilism Before Nietzsche (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995).
  • Gillespie, Michael Allen and Strong, Tracy B. ed. Nietzsche’s New Seas (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988).
  • Golomb, Jacob and Robert S. Wistrich ed. Nietzsche, Godfather of Fascism? On the Uses and Abuse of a Philosophy (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2002).
  • Habermas, Jürgen. Der philosophische Diskurs der Moderne (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1985), available in English under the title, The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity, trans. Frederick Lawrence (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1987).
    • These lectures offer a historical reading of Nietzsche’s decisive role in interrupting “the discourse of Modernity” and abandoning its emancipatory content. Habermas detects two dominant strains of post-Nietzschean philosophical rhetoric: a Dionysian messianism (transmitted through Heidegger and Derrida) which longs for the absent god and a fetishization of power, heterogeneity, and subversion (found in Bataille and Foucault).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Nietzsches Wort‘Gott is tot,’” in Holzwege (Frankfurt: Vittorio Klostermann, 1952 [written in 1943]). The essay is available to English readers as “Nietzsche’s Word: God is dead” in The Question Concerning Technology and other essays, trans. William Lovitt; co-edited J. Glenn Gray and Joan Stambaugh (New York: Harper, 1977).
    • This essay is Heidegger’s first published and most concise treatment of Nietzsche.
    • Heidegger’s preparation for this essay includes several lecture courses devoted entirely to Nietzsche’s philosophy, taught at the University of Freiburg from 1936 to 1940.
    • The published form of these lectures first appeared during 1961 in two volumes.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Nietzsche I-II (Pfulligen: Neske, 1961).
    • Beginning in 1979, Heidegger’s Nietzsche lectures at Freiberg became available to English readers in piecemeal fashion, along with other materials in a somewhat confusing manner, in a two edition, four-volume, set.
  • Heidegger, Martin . Nietzsche, vol. I-IV, trans. David Farrell Krell, (San Francisco: Harper, 1979ff).
    • The philosophy of Nietzsche plays a prominent role in several other works by Heidegger.
  • Heidegger, Martin.  “Platons Lehre von der Wahrheit,”(written in 1930, revised in 1940), published in Wegmarken (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 1967); available in English under the title, “Plato’s Doctrine of Truth,” in Pathmarks, ed. William McNeill (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Was Heisst Denken?” (Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1954); available in English under the title, “What is Called Thinking?,” trans. J. Glenn Gray and Fred Wieck (San Francisco: Harper, 1968).
  • Heidegger, Martin. “Wer ist Nietzsches Zarathustra?” in Vorträge und Aufsätze (Stuttgart: Neske, 1954); available in English under the title, “Who is Nietzsche’s Zarathustra?” in Nietzsche vol. II trans. David Farrell Krell, (San Francisco: Harper, 1979), 209-233.
  • Jaspers, Karl. Nietzsche. Einführung in das Verständnis seines Philosophierens (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1936); available in English under the title, Nietzsche: An Introduction to the Understanding of His Philosophical Activity, trans. Charles F. Wallraff and Frederick J. Schmitz (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997)
  • Kaufmann, Walter. Nietzsche: Philosopher, Psychologist, Antichrist, 4th edition: (Princeton: PUP, 1974). Kaufmann’s study was a watershed text in the history of Nietzsche reception in the United States
  • Klossowski, Pierre. Nietzsche et le cercle vicieux (Paris: Mercure de France, 1969), available in English under the title, Nietzsche and the Vicious Circle, trans. Daniel W. Smith (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press and Athlone Press, 1997)
  • Lambert, Laurence. Leo Strauss and Nietzsche (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996)
  • Lambert, Laurence. Nietzsche’s Teaching: An Interpretation of ‘Thus Spoke Zarathustra,’ (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986)
  • Leiter, Brian. Nietzsche on Morality (London: Routledge, 2002).
    • Leiter plays down the ineffable aspects of Nietzsche’s thought in order to elaborate formally and concisely Nietzsche’s writings on morality, especially from the Genealogy. This approach lends credit to the claim that Nietzsche was foremost a moral philosopher with pragmatic, even analytic consistency
  • Löwith, Karl. Nietzsche’s Philosophy of the Eternal Return of the Same, trans. J. Harvey Lomax (Berkley: University of California Press, 1997).
    • Löwith’s study was originally produced in the mid 1930’s, during a wave of interest that included treatments by Heidegger and Jaspers. Like these works, Löwith attempted to correct Alfred Bäumler’s political misappropriation. While National Socialist renditions glorify subjectivity and power in will to power and to the exclusion of eternal return and other ineffable concepts, Löwith places eternal return at the forefront of Nietzsche’s thought, arguing that such thought is thereby flawed with internal contradictions
  • MacIntyre, Ben. Forgotten Fatherland: The Search for Elisabeth Nietzsche (New York: Farrar, Strauss, Giroux 1992).
    • This study offers a somewhat informative, if rather sensationalistic, account of Elizabeth and Bernhard Förster’s sordid misadventure in Paraguay. This title should not be counted on, however, for any sort of understanding of Nietzsche’s philosophy
  • Michelfelder, Diane P. and Palmer, Richard E. eds. Dialogue and Deconstruction: The Gadamer-Derrida Encounter (Albany: SUNY Press, 1989).
    • This text chronicles an interesting confrontation on Nietzsche reception between two landmark philosophers of the late twentieth century. The encounter regards Heidegger’s reading of Nietzsche and what it implies for post-Heideggerian thought
  • Montinari, Mazzino. Reading Nietzsche trans. Greg Whitlock (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2003).
    • With Giorgio Colli, Montinari was coeditor of the KSA and the first volumes of the KGW. This translation of his collection of lectures and essays originally published in 1982 portrays Nietzsche being primarily interested in science, albeit taken off course for a time by Wagner and their shared interest in Schopenhauer. Montinari’s Nietzsche is best characterized as having a lifelong “passion for knowledge.” However, Montinari’s insights into previous editions of Nietzsche’s corpus, and the editorial politics behind these editions, may be the most valuable parts of this interesting work
  • Mueller-Lauter,Wolfgang. Nietzsche: His Philosophy of Contradictions and the Contradictions of His Philosophy, trans. David J. Parent (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1999)
  • Nehamas, Alexander. Nietzsche: Life as Literature, (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1985).
  • Porter, James I.  Nietzsche and the Philology of the Future (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000).
    • Porter’s study places Nietzsche’s philology in historical context and shows how this training prepared hermeneutic gestures found in later Nietzsche’s philosophy of interpretation
  • Porter, James I. The Invention of Dionysus: An Essay on the Birth of Tragedy (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000)
  • Schacht, Richard. Nietzsche: The Great Philosophers (London: Routledge, 1983)
  • Schacht, Richard. Making Sense of Nietzsche: Reflections Timely and Untimely (Champagne/Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1995)
  • Schrift, Alan D. Nietzsche’s French Legacy: A Genealogy of Poststructuralism (New York: Routledge, 1995).
    • As the title promises, this text surveys aspects of the French reception of Nietzsche
  • Schutte, Ofelia. Beyond Nihilism: Nietzsche Without Masks (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984)
  • Strauss, Leo. “Note on the Plan of Nietzsche’s Beyond Good and Evil” in Studies in Platonic Political Philosophy (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1983).
    • Strauss’ take on Nietzsche, here and elsewhere, has generated quite a bit of scholarship on its own
  • Strong, Tracy B. Friedrich Nietzsche and the Politics of Transfiguration: Expanded Edition, (Berkley: University of California Press, 1988).
    • Strong’s reading is somewhat esoteric, but it nevertheless brings out important political tensions seemingly implied in Nietzsche’s encounter with Socrates, Aeschylus, and other Greeks
  • Vattimo, Gianni. The End of Modernity trans. Jon R. Snyder (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins, 1988)
  • Vattimo, Gianni. Nihilism and Emancipation (New York: Columbia University Press, 2004).
    • With these titles and several others, Vattimo takes up Heidegger’s transmission of Nietzsche and works out the issue of “completed nihilism” with impressive results. Vattimo’s Nietzsche emerges as one of the best philosophical resources for grounding emancipatory discourse in the twentieth first century
  • Waite, Geoff. Nietzsche’s Corps/e, (Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 1996).
    • Waite offers a richly thematized, innovative Kulturkampf using Nietzsche-reception itself as a wedge for breaking open a variety of late-twentieth century issues
  • Yovel, Yirmiyahu. Dark Riddle: Hegel, Nietzsche, and the Jews (University Park, PA: Penn State University Press, 1998)
  • Zimmerman, Michael. Heidegger’s Confrontation with Modernity: Technology, Politics, Art (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990).
    • Zimmerman delivers a useful text for understanding this key conduit of Nietzsche reception.

f. Academic Journals in Nietzsche Studies

In addition to a typically large number full-length manuscripts on Nietzsche published every year, scholarly works in English may be found in general, academic periodicals focused on Continental philosophy, ethical theory, critical theory, the history of ideas and similar themes. In addition, some major journals are devoted entirely to Nietzsche and aligned topics. Related both to the issue of orthodoxy and to the backlash against multiplicity in Nietzsche interpretation, the value of having so many outlets available for Nietzsche commentators has even been questioned. The following journals are devoted specifically to Nietzsche studies.

  • Nietzsche-Studien (Berlin: de Gruyter).
  • The Journal of Nietzsche Studies (University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press).
  • New Nietzsche Studies: The Journal of the Nietzsche Society (New York: Nietzsche Society).

Author Information

Dale Wilkerson
University of North Texas, Denton
U. S. A.

Solovyov, Vladimir

Vladimir Solovyov (1853—1900)

SolovyovSolovyov was a 19th Century Russian Philosopher. He is considered a prolific but complicated character. His output aimed to be a comprehensive philosophical system, yet he produced what is considered contentious, theosophical and fundamentally inconclusive results.

This article examines in detail Slovyov’s five main works. It also looks into the controversy he generated and his possible philosophical legacy. In the course of five main works – three were completed, two were left unfinished – Solovyov demonstrated a predilection for grand topics of study and an ambitious aim to produce a comprehensive philosophical system that rejected accepted notions of contemporary European Philosophy. In his first major work, The Crisis of Western Philosophy (written when he was twenty-one), he argues against positivism and for moving away from a dichotomy of “speculative” (rationalist) and “empirical” knowledge in favour of a post-philosophical enquiry that would reconcile all notions of thought in a new transcendental whole.

He carried on his attempted synthesis of rationalism, empiricism and mysticism in Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge, and he turned to a study of ethics leading to a solidifying of his epistemology in Critique of Abstract Principles.

In the later period of his life, he recast his ethics in The Justification of the Good and his epistemology in Theoretical Philosophy.

Due to his conclusions repeatedly resting on a call upon an aspect of the divine or the discovery of an “all-encompassing spirit,” the soundness of his arguments have often been called into question. For the same reason, and compounded by a tendency to express himself in theological and romantically nationalist language, he is also often dismissed as a mystic or fanatic. Although, as the article below argues, if read as a product of his time, they are more sensible and less polemical.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Interpretations of Solovyov's Philosophical Writings.
  3. The Crisis of Western Philosophy
  4. Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge
  5. Critique of Abstract Principles
  6. The Justification of the Good
  7. Theoretical Philosophy
  8. Concluding Remarks
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Solovyov was born in Moscow in 1853. His father, Sergej Mikhailovich, a professor at Moscow University, is universally recognized as one of Russia's greatest historians. After attending secondary school in Moscow, Vladimir enrolled at the university and began his studies there in the natural sciences in 1869, his particular interest at this time being biology. Already at the age of 13 he had renounced his Orthodox faith to his friends, accepting the banner of materialism perhaps best illustrated by the fictional character of Bazarov in Turgenev's novel Fathers and Sons and the actual historical figure of Pisarev. During the first two or three years of study at the university Solovyov grew disenchanted with his ardent positivism and did poorly in his examinations. An excellent student prior to this time, there is no reason for us to doubt his intellectual gifts. Nevertheless, although he himself as well as his interpreters have attributed his poor performance to growing disinterest in his course of study, this reasoning may sound to us at least somewhat disingenuous. In any case, Solovyov subsequently enrolled as an auditor in the Historical-Philosophical Faculty, then passing the examination for a degree in June 1873.

At some point during 1872 Solovyov reconverted, so to speak, to Orthodoxy. During the academic year 1873-74 he attended lectures at the Moscow Ecclesiastic Academy--an unusual step for a lay person. At this time Solovyov also began the writing of his magister's dissertation, several chapters of which were published in a Russian theological journal in advance of’ his formal defense of it in early December 1874.

The death of his Moscow University philosophy teacher Pamfil Jurkevich created a vacancy that Solovyov surely harbored hopes of eventually filling. Nevertheless, despite being passed over, owing, at least in part, to his young age and lack of credentials, he was named a docent (lecturer) in philosophy. In spite of taking up his teaching duties with enthusiasm, within a few months Solovyov applied for a scholarship to do research abroad, primarily in London's British Museum.

His stay in the English capital was met with mixed emotions, but it could not have been entirely unpleasant, for in mid-September 1875 he was still informing his mother of plans to return to Russia only the following summer. For whatever reason, though, Solovyov abruptly changed his mind, writing again to his mother a mere month later that his work required him to go to Egypt via Italy and Greece. Some have attributed his change of plans to a mystical experience while sitting in the reading room of the Museum!

Upon his return to Russia the following year, Solovyov taught philosophy at Moscow University. He began work on a text that we know as the Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge, but which he never finished. In early 1877 Solovyov relinquished his university position due to his aversion towards academic politics, took up residence in St. Petersburg and accepted employment in the Ministry of Public Education. While preparing his doctoral dissertation, Solovyov gave a series of highly successful popular lectures at St. Petersburg University that was later published as Lectures on Divine Humanity, and in 1880 he defended a doctoral dissertation at St. Petersburg University. Any lingering hope Solovyov may have entertained of obtaining a professorship in Russia were dashed when in early 1881 during a public lecture he appealed to the Tsar to pardon the regicides of the latter's father Alexander II.

For the remainder of the 1880s, despite his prolificacy, Solovyov concerned himself with themes of little interest to contemporary Western philosophy. He returned, however, to traditional philosophical issues in the 1890s, working in particular on ethics and epistemology. His studies on the latter, however, were left quite incomplete owing to his premature death in 1900 at the age of 47. At the end Solovyov, together with his younger brother, was also preparing a new Russian translation of Plato's works.

2. Interpretations of Solovyov's Philosophical Writings

Despite the vast amount of secondary literature, particularly, of course, in Russian, little, especially that in English, is of interest to the professionally-trained philosopher. Nevertheless, even while memory of him was still fresh, many of his friends differed sharply on key issues involved in interpreting Solovyov's writings and legacy.

Among the topics debated over the years has been the number of phases or periods through which his thought passed. Opinions have ranged from four to just one, depending largely on the different criteria selected for demarcating one period from another. Those who hold that Solovyov's thought underwent no "fundamental change" [Shein] do not deny that there were modifications but simply maintain that the fundamental thrust of his philosophy remained unaltered over the course of time. Others see different emphases in Solovyov's work from decade to decade. Yet in one of the most philosophically-informed interpretations, Solovyov moved from a philosophy of "integral knowledge" to a later phenomenological phase that anticipated the "essential methodology" of the German movement [Dahm].

Historically, another central concern among interpreters has been the extent of Solovyov's indebtedness to various other figures. Whereas several have stressed the influence of, if not an outright borrowing from, the late Schelling [Mueller, Shein], at least one prominent scholar has sought to accentuate Solovyov's independence and creativity [Losev]. Still others have argued for Solovyov's indebtedness to Hegel [Navickas], Kant [Vvedenskij], Boehme [David], the Russian Slavophiles and the philosophically-minded theologians Jurkevich and Kudryavtsev.

In Russia itself the thesis that Solovyov had no epistemology [Radlov] evoked a spirited rebuttal [Ern] that has continued in North America [Shein, Navickas]. None of these scholars, however, has demonstrated the presence of more than a rudimentary epistemology, at least as that term is currently employed in contemporary philosophy.

Additionally, the vast majority of secondary studies have dealt with Solovyov's mysticism and views on religion, nationalism, social issues, and the role of Russia in world history. Consequently, it is not surprising that those not directly acquainted with his explicit philosophical writings and their Russian context view Solovyov as having nothing of interest to say in philosophy proper. We should also mention one of the historically most influential views, one that initially at least appears quite plausible. Berdyaev, seeing Solovyov as a paradoxical figure, distinguished a day -- from a night-Solovyov. The "day-Solovyov" was a philosophical rationalist, in the broad sense, an idealist, who sought to convey his highly metaphysical religious and ontological conceptions through philosophical discourse utilizing terms current at the time; the "night -- Solovyov" was a mystic who conveyed his personal revelations largely through poetry.

3. The Crisis of Western Philosophy

This, Solovyov's first major work, displays youthful enthusiasm, vision, optimism and a large measure of audacity. Unfortunately, it is also at times repetitious and replete with sweeping generalizations, unsubstantiated conclusions, and non sequiturs. The bulk of the work is an excursion in the history of modern philosophy that attempts to substantiate and amplify Solovyov's justly famous claims, made in the opening lines, that: (i) philosophy -- qua a body of abstract, purely theoretical knowledge -- has finished its development; (ii) philosophy in this sense is no longer nor will it ever again be maintained by anyone; (iii) philosophy has bequeathed to its successor certain accomplishments or results that this successor will utilize to resolve the problems that philosophy has unsuccessfully attempted to resolve.

Solovyov tells us that his ambitious program differs from positivism in that, unlike the latter, he understands the superseded artifact called "philosophy" to include not merely its "speculative" but also its "empirical" direction. Whether these two directions constitute the entirety of modern philosophy, i.e., whether there has been any historical manifestation of another sense of philosophy, one that is not purely theoretical, during the modern era, is unclear. Also left unclear is what precisely Solovyov means by "positivism." He mentions as representatives of that doctrine Mill, Spencer and Comte, whose views were by no means identical, and mentions as the fundamental tenet of positivism that "independent reality cannot be given in external experience." This I take to mean that experience yields knowledge merely of things as they appear, not as they are "in themselves." Solovyov has, it would seem, confused positivism with phenomenalism.

Solovyov's reading of the development of modern philosophy proceeds along the lines of Hegel's own interpretation. He sees Hegel's "panlogism" as the necessary result of Western philosophy. The "necessity" here is clearly conceptual, although Solovyov implicitly accepts without further ado that this necessity has, as a matter of fact, been historically manifested in the form of individual philosophies. Moreover, in line with Hegel's apparent self-interpretation Solovyov agrees that the former's system permits no further development. For the latter, at least, this is because, having rejected the law of (non)contradiction, Hegel's philosophy sees internal contradiction, which otherwise would lead to further development, as a "logical necessity," i.e., as something the philosophy itself requires and is accommodated within the system itself.

Similarly, Solovyov's analysis of the movement from Hegelianism to mid-19th century German materialism is largely indebted to the left-Hegelians. Solovyov, however, merely claims that one can exit Hegelianism by acknowledging its fundamental one-sidedness. Yet in the next breath, as it were, he holds that the emergence of empiricism, qua materialism, was necessary. Out of the phenomenalism of empiricism arises Schopenhauer's philosophy and thence Eduard von Hartmann's.

All representatives of Western philosophy, including to some extent Schopenhauer and von Hartmann, see rational knowledge as the decomposition of intuition into its sensuous and logical elements. Such knowledge, however, in breaking up the concrete into abstractions without re-synthesizing them, additionally is unable to recognize these abstractions as such but must hypostatize them, that is, assign real existence to them.. Nevertheless, even were we to grant Solovyov's audacious thesis that all Western philosophers have done this abstraction and hypostatizing, it by no means follows that rational thought necessarily has had to follow this procedure.

According to Solovyov, von Hartmann, in particular, is aware of the one-sidedness of both rationalism and empiricism, which respectively single out the logical and the sense element in cognition to the exclusion of the other. Nevertheless, he too hypostatizes will and idea instead of realizing that the only way to avoid any and all bifurcations is through a recognition of what Solovyov terms "the fundamental metaphysical principle," namely that the all- encompassing spirit is the truly existent. This hastily enunciated conclusion receives here no further argument. Nor does Solovyov dwell on establishing his ultimate claim that the results of Western philosophical development, issuing in the discovery of the all-encompassing spirit, agree with the religious beliefs of the Eastern Church fathers.

4. Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge

This work originally appeared during 1877 as a series of articles in an official journal published by the Ministry of Education (Zhurnal Ministerstva narodnogo prosveshchenija). Of Solovyov's major writings it is probably the most difficult for the philosopher today to understand owing, to a large degree, to its forced trichotomization of philosophical issues and options and its extensive use of terms drawn from mystical sources even when employed in a quite different sense.

There are three fundamental aspects, or "subjective foundations," of human life--in Solovyov's terminology, "forms of being." They are: feeling, thinking and willing. Each of these has both a personal and a social side, and each has its objective intentional object. These are, respectively, objective beauty, objective truth and the objective good. Three fundamental forms of the social union arise from human striving for the good: economic society, political society (government), and spiritual society. Likewise in the pursuit of truth there arises positive science, abstract philosophy, and theology. Lastly, in the sphere of feeling we have the technical arts, such as architecture, the fine arts and a form of mysticism, which Solovyov emphasizes is an immediate spiritual connection with the transcendent world and as such is not to be confused with the term "mysticism" as used to indicate a reflection on that connection.

Human cultural evolution has literally passed through these forms and done so according to what Solovyov calls "an incontestable law of development." Economic socialism, positivism and utilitarian realism represent for him the highest point yet of Western civilization and, in line with his earlier work, the final stage of its development. But Western civilization with its social, economic, philosophic and scientific atomization represents only a second, transitional phase in human development. The next, final stage, characterized by freedom from all one- sidedness and elevation over special interests is presently a "tribal character" of the Slavic peoples and, in particular, of the Russian nation.

Although undoubtedly of some historical interest as an expression of and contribution to ideas circulating in Russia as to the country's role in world affairs, Solovyov expounded all the above without argument and as such is of little interest to contemporary philosophy. Of somewhat greater value is his critique of traditional philosophical directions.

Developing its essential principle to the end, empiricism holds that I know only what the senses tell me. Consequently, I know even of myself only through conscious impressions, which, in turn, means that I am nothing but states of consciousness. Yet my consciousness presupposes me. Thus, we have found that empiricism leads, by reductio ad absurdum, to its self-refutation. The means to avoid such a conclusion, however, lies in recognizing the absolute being of the cognizing subject, which, in short, is idealism.

Likewise, the consistent development of the idealist principle leads to a denial of the epistemic subject and pure thought. The dissolution of these two directions means the collapse of all abstract philosophy. We are left with two choices: either complete skepticism or the view that what truly exists has an independent reality quite apart from our material world, a view Solovyov terms "mysticism." With mysticism we have, in Solovyov's view, exhausted all logical options. That is, having seen that holding the truly existing to be either the cognized object or the cognizing subject leads to absurdity, the sole remaining logical possibility is that offered by mysticism, which, thus, completes the "circle of possible philosophical views." Although empiricism and rationalism (= idealism) rest on false principles, their respective objective contents, external experience, qua the foundation of natural science, and logical thought, qua the foundation of pure philosophy, are to be synthesized or encompassed along with mystical knowledge in "integral knowledge," what Solovyov terms "theosophy."

For whatever reason, Philosophical Principles of Integral Knowledge remained incomplete. Despite its expression of his own views, which undoubtedly at this stage were greatly indebted to the Slavophiles, Solovyov altered his original plan to submit this work as a doctoral dissertation. Instead, in April 1880 he defended at St. Petersburg University a large work that he had begun at approximately the same time as the Philosophical Principles and which, like the latter, appeared in serialized form starting in 1877 and as a separate book in 1880.

5. Critique of Abstract Principles

Originally planned to comprise three parts, ethics, epistemology and aesthetics, (which alone already reveals a debt to Kant) the completed work never turned to the last of these, on which, however, Solovyov labored extensively. Nevertheless, owing largely to its traditional philosophical style and its extended treatment of major historical figures, the Critique remains the most accessible of Solovyov's major early writings today.

(1) Subjective Ethics. Over the course of human development a number of principles have been advanced in pursuit of various goals deemed to be that for which human actions should strive—goals such as pleasure, happiness, fulfilment of duties, adherence to God's will, etc. Certainly seeking happiness, pleasure, or the fulfilment of duty is not unequivocally wrong. Yet the pursuit of any one of these alone without the others cannot provide a basis for a totally satisfactory ethical system. A higher synthesis or, if you will, a more encompassing unity is needed, one that will reveal how and when any of these particular pursuits is ethically warranted. Such a unity will show the truth, and thereby the error, of singling out any particular moment of the unity as sufficient alone. Doing so, that is, showing the proper place of each principle, showing them as necessary yet inadequate stages on the way to a complete synthetic system is what Solovyov means by "the critical method."

In the end all moral theories that rest on an empirical basis, something factual in human nature, fail because they cannot provide and account for obligation. The essential feature of moral law, as Solovyov understands the concept, is its absolute necessity for all rational beings. The Kantian influence here is unmistakable and indubitable. Nevertheless, Solovyov parts company with Kant in expressing that a natural inclination in support of an obligatory action enhances the moral value of an action. Since duty is the general form of the moral principle, whereas an inclination serves as the psychological motive for a moral action, i.e., as the material aspect of morality, the two cannot contradict one another.

The Kantian categorical imperative, which Solovyov, in general, endorses, presupposes freedom. Of course, we all feel that our actions are free, but what kind of freedom is this? Here Solovyov approaches phenomenology in stating that the job of philosophy is to analyze this feeling with an eye to determining what it is we are aware of. Undoubtedly, for the most part we can do as we please, but such freedom is freedom of action. The question, however, is whether I can actually want something other than I do, i.e., whether the will is free.

Again like Kant, Solovyov believes all our actions, even the will itself, is, at least viewed empirically, subject to the law of causality. From the moral perspective, however, there is a "causality of freedom," a freedom to initiate a causal sequence on the part of practical reason. In other words, empirically the will is determined, whereas transcendentally it is free. Solovyov, though, goes on to pose, at least rhetorically, the question whether this transcendental freedom is genuine or could it be that the will is subject to transcendental conditions. In doing so, he reveals that his conception of "transcendental" differs from that of Kant. Nevertheless, waving aside all difficulties associated with a resolution of the metaphysical issue of freedom of the will, Solovyov tells us, ethics has no need of such investigations; reason and empirical inquiry are sufficient. The criteria of moral activity lie in its universality and necessity, i.e., that the principle of one's action can be made a universal law.

(2) Objective Ethics. In order that the good determine my will I must be subjectively convinced that the consequent action can be realized. This moral action presupposes a certain knowledge of and is conditioned by society. Subjective ethics instructs us that we should treat others not as means but as ends. Likewise, they should treat me as an end. Solovyov terms a community of beings freely striving to realize each other's good as if it were his or her own good "free communality." Although some undoubtedly see material wealth as a goal, it cannot serve as a moral goal. Rather, the goal of free communality is the just distribution of wealth, which, in turn, requires an organization to administer fair and equal treatment of and to all, in other words, a political arrangement or government. To make the other person's good my good, I must recognize such concern as obligatory. That is, I must recognize the other as having rights, which my material interests cannot infringe.

If all individuals acted for the benefit of all, there would be no need for a coordination of interests, for interests would not be in conflict. There is, however, no universal consensus on benefits and often enough individually perceived benefits conflict. In this need for adjudication lies a source of government and law. Laws express the negative side of morality, i.e., they do not say what should be done, but what is not permitted. Thus, the legal order is unable to provide positive directives, precisely because what humans specifically should do and concretely aspire to attain remains conditional and contingent. The absolute, unconditional form of morality demands an absolute, unconditional content, namely, an absolute goal.

As a finite being, the human individual cannot attain the absolute except through positive interaction with all others. Whereas in the legal order each individual is limited by the other, in the aspiration or striving for the absolute the other aids or completes the self. Such a union of beings is grounded psychologically in love. As a contingent being the human individual cannot fully realize an absolute object or goal. Only in the process of individuals working in concert, forming a "total-unity," does love become a non-contingent state. Only in an inner unity with all does man realize what Solovyov calls "the divine principle."

Solovyov himself views his position as diametrically opposed to that of Kant, who from absolute moral obligation was led to postulating the existence of God, immortality and human freedom. For Solovyov, the realization of morality presupposes an affirmative metaphysics. Once we progress from Kant's purely subjective ethics to an objective understanding of ethics, we see the need for a conviction in the theoretical validity of Kant's three postulates, their metaphysical truth independent of their practical desirability.

Again differing from Kant, and Fichte too, Solovyov at this point in his life rejects the priority of ethics over metaphysics. The genuine force of the moral principle rests on the existence of the absolute order. And the necessary conviction in this order can be had only if we know it to be true, which demands an epistemological inquiry.

(3) Epistemology/Metaphysics. "To know what we should do we must know what is," Solovyov tells us. To say "what is," however, is informative only in contrast to saying, at least implicitly, "what is not" -- this we already know from the opening pages of Hegel's Logic. One answer is that the true is that which objectively exists independent of any knowing subject. Here Solovyov leads us down a path strikingly similar, at least in outline, to that taken in the initial chapters of Hegel's Phenomenology. If the objectively real is the true, then sense certainty is our guarantee of having obtained it. But this certainty cannot be that of an individual knowing subject alone, for truth is objective and thus the same for everyone. Truth must not be in the facts but the things that make up the facts. Moreover, truth cannot be the individual things in isolation, for truths would then be isomorphic with the number of things. Such a conception of truth is vacuous; no, truth is one. With this Solovyov believes he has passed to naturalism.

Of course, our immediate sense experience lacks universality and does not in all its facets correspond to objective reality. Clearly, many qualities of objects, for example, color and taste, are subjective. Thus, reality must be what is general or present in all sense experience. To the general foundation of sensation corresponds the general foundation of things, namely, that conveyed through the sense of touch, i.e., the experience of resistance. The general foundation of objective being is its impenetrability.

Holding true being to be single and impenetrable, however, remains untenable. Through a series of dialectical maneuvers, reminiscent of Hegel, Solovyov arrives at the position that true being contains multiplicity. That is, whereas it is singular owing to absolute impenetrability, it consists of separate particles, each of which is impenetrable. Having in this way passed to atomism, Solovyov provides a depiction largely indebted to Kant's Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Solovyov recognizes that we have reached atomism, not through some experimental technique but through philosophical, logical reasoning. But every scientific explanation of the ultimate constituents of reality transgresses the bounds of experience. We return to the viewpoint that reality belongs to appearances alone, i.e., what is given in experience. Now, however, our realism has been dialectically transformed into a phenomenal or critical realism.

According to phenomenal realism, absolute reality is ultimately inaccessible to cognition. Nevertheless, that which cognitively is accessible constitutes a relative objectivity and is our sole standard for determining truth and thus knowledge. In this sensualism -- for that is what it is -- we refer particular sensations to definite objects. These objects are taken as objectively real despite the manifest subjectivity of sensation in general. Thus, objectification, as the imparting of the sense of objectivity onto the content of sensations, must be an independent activity of the cognizing subject.

Objectification, alone, cannot account for the definite object before me to which all my sensations of that object refer as parts or aspects. In addition to objectification there must be a unification or synthesizing of sensations, and this process or act is again distinct from sensing and certainly is not part of the sensation itself. Again evoking an image of Kant in the reader, Solovyov calls the independent cognitive act whereby sense data are formed into definite objective representations the imagination.

The two factors we have discerned, one contributed by the epistemic subject and the other by sensation, are absolutely independent of each other. Cognition requires both, but what connects them remains unanswered. According to Solovyov, any connection implies dependence, but the a priori element certainly cannot be dependent on the empirical. For, following Hume, from the factual we cannot deduce the universality and the necessity of a law. The other alternative is to have the content of true cognition dependent on the forms of reason; such is the approach of Hegel's absolute rationalism. However, if all the determinations of being are created by cognition, then at the beginning we have only the pure form of cognition, pure thought, a concept of being in general. Solovyov finds such a starting point to be vacuous. For although Hegel correctly realizes the general form of truth to be universality, it is a negative conception from which nothing can be derived. The positive conception is a whole that contains everything in itself, not, as in Hegel, one that everything contains in itself.

For Solovyov, truth, in short, is the whole, and, consequently, each particular fact in isolation from the whole is false. Again Solovyov's position on rationality bears an uncanny resemblance to that of Hegel, although in the former's eyes this resemblance is superficial. Reason is the whole, and so the rationality of a particular fact lies in its interrelation with the whole. A fact divorced from the whole is irrational.

True knowledge implies the whole, the truly existent, the absolute. Following Solovyov's "dialectical" thinking, the absolute, qua absolute, presupposes a non-absolute; one (or the whole) presupposes the many. And, again conjuring up visions of Hegel, if the absolute is the one, the non-absolute is becoming the one. The latter can become the one only if it has the divine element potentially. In nature, the one exists only potentially, whereas in humans it is actual, though only ideally, i.e., in consciousness.

The object of knowledge has three forms: 1) as it appears to us empirically, 2) as conceptually ideal, and 3) as existing absolutely independent of our cognition of it. Our concepts and sensations would be viewed merely as subjective states were it not for the third form. The basis for this form is a third sort of cognition, without which objective truth would elude us. A study of the history of philosophy correctly shows that neither the senses nor the intellect, whether separately or in combination, can satisfactorily account for the third form. Sensations are relative, and concepts conditional. Indeed, the referral of our thoughts and sensations to an object in knowledge, thus, presupposes this third sort of cognition. Such cognition, namely, faith or mystical knowledge, would itself be impossible if the subject and the object of knowledge were completely divorced. In this interaction we perceive the object's essence or "idea," its constancy. The imagination (here, let us recall Kant), at a non-conscious level, organizes the manifold given by sense experience into an object via a referral of this manifold to the "idea" of the object.

Solovyov believes he has demonstrated that all knowledge arises through the confluence of empirical, rational and "mystical" elements. Only philosophical analysis can discover the role of the mystical. Just as an isolation of the first two elements has historically led to empiricism and rationalism respectively, so the mystical element has been accentuated by traditional theology. And just as the former directions have given rise to dogmatic manifestations, so too has theology found its dogmatic exponents. The task before us lies in freeing the three directions of their exclusiveness, intentionally integrating and organizing true knowledge into a complete system, which Solovyov called "free theosophy."

6. The Justification of the Good

After the completion of the works mentioned above, Solovyov largely withdrew from philosophy, both as a profession and its concerns. During the 1880s he devoted himself increasingly to theological and topical social issues of little, if any, concern to the contemporary philosopher. However, in 1894 Solovyov took to preparing a second edition of the Critique of Abstract Principles. Owing, though, to an evolution, and thereby significant changes, in his viewpoint, he soon abandoned this venture and embarked on an entirely new statement of his philosophical views. Just as in his earlier treatise, Solovyov again intended to treat ethical issues before turning to an epistemological inquiry.

The Justification of the Good appeared in book form in 1897. Many, though not all, of its chapters had previously been published in several well-known philosophical and literary journals over the course of the previous three years. Largely in response to criticisms of the book or its serialized chapters, Solovyov managed to complete a second edition, which was published in 1899 and accompanied by a new preface.

Most notably, Solovyov now holds that ethics is an independent discipline. In this he finds himself in solidarity with Kant, who made this "great discovery," as Solovyov put it. Knowledge of good and evil is accessible to all individuals possessing reason and a conscience and needs neither divine revelation nor epistemological deduction. Although philosophical analysis surely is unable to instill a certainty that I, the analyst, alone exist, solipsism even if true would eliminate only objective ethics. There is another, a subjective side to ethics that concerns duties to oneself. Likewise, morality is independent of the metaphysical question concerning freedom of the will. From the independence of ethics Solovyov draws the conclusion that life has meaning and, coupled with this, we can legitimately speak of a moral order.

The natural bases of morality, from which ethics as an independent discipline can be deduced and which form the basis of moral consciousness, are shame, pity and reverence. Shame reveals to man his higher human dignity. It sets the human apart from the animal world. Pity forms the basis of all of man's social relations to others. Reverence establishes the moral basis of man's relation to that which is higher to himself and, as such, is the root of religion.

Each of the three bases, Solovyov tells us, may be considered from three sides or points of view. Shame as a virtue reveals itself as modesty, pity as compassion and reverence as piety. All other proposed virtues are essentially expressions of one of these three. The other two points of view, as a principle of action and as a condition of an ensuing moral action, are interconnected with the first such that the first logically contains the others.

Interestingly, truthfulness is not itself a formal virtue. Solovyov opposes one sort of extreme ethical formalism, arguing that making a factually false statement is not always a lie in the moral sense. The nature of the will behind the action must be taken into account.

Likewise, despite his enormous respect for Kant's work in the field of ethics, Solovyov rejects viewing God and the immortality of the soul as postulates. God's existence, he tells us, is not a deduction from religious feeling or experience but its immediate content, i.e., that which is experienced. Furthermore, he adds that God and the soul are "direct creative forces of moral reality." How we are to interpret these claims in light of the supposed independence of ethics is contentious unless, of course, we find Solovyov guilty of simple-mindedness. Indeed one of his own friends [Trubeckoj] wrote: "It is not difficult to convince ourselves that these arguments about the independence of ethics are refuted on every later page in the Justification of the Good." However we look upon Solovyov's pronouncements, the Deity plays a significant role in his ethics. Solovyov provides a facile answer to the perennial question of how a morally perfect God can permit the existence of evil: Its elimination would mean the annihilation of human freedom thereby rendering free goodness (good without freedom is imperfect) impossible. Thus, God permits evil, because its removal would be a greater evil.

Often, all too often, Solovyov is prone to express himself in metaphysical, indeed theological, terms that do little to clarify his position. The realization of the Kingdom of God, he tells us, is the goal of life. What he means, however, is that the realization of a perfect moral order, in which the relations between individuals and the collective whole's relations to each individual are morally correct, is all that can be rationally desired. Each of us understands that the attainment of moral perfection is not a solipsistic enterprise, i.e., that the Kingdom of God can only be achieved if we each want it and collectively attain it. The individual can attain the moral ideal only in and through society. Christianity alone offers the idea of the perfect individual and the perfect society. Other ideas have been presented (Solovyov mentions Buddhism and Platonism), of course, and these have been historically necessary for the attainment of the universal human consciousness that Christianity promises.

Man's correct relations to God, his fellow humans and his own material nature, in accordance with the three foundations of morality – piety, pity (compassion) and shame – are collectively organized in three forms. The Church is collectively organized piety, whereas the state is collectively organized pity or compassion. To view the state in such terms already tells us a great deal concerning how Solovyov views the state's mission and, consequently, his general stand toward laissez-faire doctrines. Although owing to the connection between legality and morality one can speak of a Christian state, this is not to say that in pre-Christian times the state had no moral foundations. Just as the pagan can know the moral law "written in his heart," (an expression of St. Paul's that Solovyov was fond of invoking but also reminiscent of Kant's "the moral law within") so too the pagan state has two functions: 1) to preserve the foundation of social life necessary for continued human existence, and 2) to improve the condition of humanity.

At the end of The Justification of the Good Solovyov attempts in the most cursory fashion to make a transition to epistemology. He claims that the struggle between good and evil raises the question of the latter's origin, which in turn ultimately requires an epistemological inquiry. That ethics is an independent discipline does not mean that it is not connected to metaphysics and the theory of knowledge. One can study ethics in its entirety without first having answers to all other philosophical problems much as one can be an excellent swimmer without knowing the physics of buoyancy.

7. Theoretical Philosophy

During the last few years of his life Solovyov sought to recast his thoughts on epistemology. Surely he intended to publish in serial fashion the various chapters of a planned book on the topic, much as he did The Justification of the Good. Unfortunately at the time of his death in 1900 only three chapters were completed, and it is only on the basis of these that we can judge his new standpoint. Nevertheless, on the basis of these meager writings we can already see that Solovyov's new epistemological reflections exhibit a greater transformation of his thoughts on the subject than does his ethics. Whereas a suggested affinity between these ideas and later German phenomenology must be viewed with caution and, in light of his earlier thoughts, a measure of skepticism, there can be little doubt that to all appearances Solovyov spoke and thought in this late work in a philosophical idiom close to that with which we have become familiar in the 20th century.

For Solovyov epistemology concerns itself with the validity of knowledge in itself, that is, not in terms of whether it is useful in practice or provides a basis for an ethical system that has for whatever reason been accepted. Perhaps not surprisingly then, particularly in light of his firm religious views, Solovyov adheres to a correspondence theory, saying that knowledge is the agreement of a thought of an object with the actual object. The open questions are how such an agreement is possible and how do we know that we know.

The Cartesian "I think, therefore I am" leads us virtually nowhere. Admittedly the claim contains indubitable knowledge, but it is merely that of a subjective reality. I might just as well be thinking of an illusory book as of an actually existing one. How do we get beyond the "I think"? How do we distinguish a dream from reality? The criteria are not present in the immediacy of the consciously intended object. To claim as did some Russian philosophers in his own day that the reality of the external world is an immediately given fact appears to Solovyov an arbitrary opinion hardly worthy of philosophy. Nor is it possible to deduce from the Cartesian inference that the I is a thinking substance. Here is the root of Descartes' error. The self discovered in self-consciousness has the same status as the object of consciousness, i.e., both have phenomenal existence. If we cannot say what this object of my consciousness is like in itself, i.e., apart from my conscious acts, so too we cannot say what the subject of consciousness is apart from consciousness and for the same reason. Likewise, just as we cannot speak about the I in itself, so too we cannot answer to whom consciousness belongs.

In "The Reliability of Reason," the second article comprising the Theoretical Philosophy, Solovyov concerns himself with affirming the universality of logical thought. In doing so he stands in opposition to the popular reductionisms, e.g., psychologism, that sought to deny any extra-temporal significance to logic. Thought itself, Solovyov tells us, requires recollection, language and intentionality. Since any logical thought is, nevertheless, a thought and since thought can be analyzed in terms of psychic functions, one could conceivably charge Solovyov with lapsing back into a psychologism, in precisely the same way as some critics have charged Husserl with doing so. And much the same defenses of Husserl's position can also be used in reply to the objection against Solovyov's stance.

The third article, "The Form of Rationality and the Reason of Truth," published in 1898, concerns itself with the proper starting points of epistemology. The first such point is the indubitable veracity of the given in immediate consciousness. There can be no doubt that the pain I experience upon stubbing my toe is genuine. The second starting point of epistemology is the objective, universal validity of rational thought. Along with Hume and Kant, Solovyov does not dispute that factual experience can provide claims only to conditional generality. Rationality alone provides universality. This universality, however, is merely formal. To distinguish the rational form from the conditional content of thought is the first essential task of philosophy. Taking up this challenge is the philosophical self or subject. Solovyov concludes, again as he always does, with a triadic distinction between the empirical subject, the logical subject and the philosophical subject. And although he labels the first the "soul," the second the "mind" and the third the "spirit," the trichotomy is contrived and the labeling, at best, imaginative with no foundation other than in Solovyov's a priori architectonic.

8. Concluding Remarks

Solovyov's relatively early death, brought on to some degree by his erratic life-style, precluded the completion of his last philosophical work. He also intended to turn his attention eventually towards aesthetics, but whether he would ever have been able to complete such a project remains doubtful. Solovyov was never at any stage of his development able to complete a systematic treatise on the topic, although he did publish a number of writings on the subject.

However beneficial our reading of Solovyov's works may be, there can be little doubt that he was very much a 19th-century figure. We can hardly take seriously his incessant predilection for triadic schemes, far in excess to anything similar in the German Idealists. His choice of terminology, drawn from an intellectual fashion of his day, also poses a formidable obstacle to the contemporary reader.

Lastly, despite, for example, an often perspicacious study of his philosophical predecessors, written during his middle years, Solovyov, in clinging obstinately to his rigid architectonic, failed to penetrate further than they. Indeed, he often fell far short of their achievements. His discussion of imagination, for example, as we saw, is much too superficial, adding nothing to that found in Kant. These shortcomings, though, should not divert us from recognizing his genuinely useful insights.

After his death, with interest surging in the mystical amid abundant decadent trends, so characteristic of decaying cultures, Solovyov's thought was seized upon by those far less interested in philosophical analysis than he was towards the end. Those who invoked his name so often in the years immediately subsequent to his death stressed the religious strivings of his middle years to the complete neglect of his final philosophical project, let alone its continuation and completion. In terms of Solovyov-studies today the philosophical project of discovering the "rational kernel within the mystical shell" [Marx], of separating the "living from the dead" [Croce], remains not simply unfulfilled but barely begun.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Sobranie sochinenij, St. Petersburg: Prosveshchenie, 1911-14.
  • Sobranie sochinenij, Brussels: Zhizn s Bogom, 1966-70.ENGLISH TRANSLATIONS
  • The Crisis of Western Philosophy (Against the Positivists), trans. by Boris Jakim, Hudson, NY: Lindisfarne Press, 1996.
  • Lectures on Divine Humanity, ed. by Boris Jakim, Lindisfarne Press, 1995.
  • The Justification of the Good, trans. by N. Duddington, New York: Macmillan, 1918.
  • "Foundations of Theoretical Philosophy," trans. by Vlada Tolley and James P. Scanlan, in Russian Philosophy, ed. James
  • M. Edie, et al., Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1965, vol. III, pp. 99-134.

b. Secondary Sources (mentioned above)

  • Helmut Dahm, Vladimir Solovyev and Max Scheler: Attempt at a Comparative Interpretation, Dordrecht, Holland: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1975.
  • Zdenek V. David, "The Influence of Jacob Boehme on Russian Religious Thought," Slavic Review, 21(1962), 1, pp. 43-64.
  • Aleksej Losev, Vladimir Solov'ev, Moscow: Mysl', 1983.
  • Ludolf Mueller, Solovjev und der Protestantismus, Freiburg: Verlag Herder, 1951.
  • Joseph L. Navickas, "Hegel and the Doctrine of Historicity of Vladimir Solovyov," in The Quest for the Absolute, ed.
  • Frederick J. Adelmann, The Hague: M. Nijhoff, 1966, pp. 135-154.
  • Louis J. Shein, "V.S. Solov'ev's Epistemology: A Re-examination," Canadian Slavic Studies, Spring 1970, vol. 4, no. 1, pp. 1-16.
  • E. N. Trubeckoj, Mirosozercanie V. S. Solov'eva, 2 vols., Moscow: Izdatel'stvo "Medium," 1995,
  • Aleksandr I. Vvedenskij, "O misticizme i kriticizme v teorii poznanija V. S. Solov'eva," Filosofskie ocherki, Prague: Plamja, 1924, pp. 45-71.

Author Information

Thomas Nemeth

Bentham, Jeremy

Jeremy Bentham (1748—1832)

benthamJeremy Bentham was an English philosopher and political radical. He is primarily known today for his moral philosophy, especially his principle of utilitarianism, which evaluates actions based upon their consequences. The relevant consequences, in particular, are the overall happiness created for everyone affected by the action. Influenced by many enlightenment thinkers, especially empiricists such as John Locke and David Hume, Bentham developed an ethical theory grounded in a largely empiricist account of human nature. He famously held a hedonistic account of both motivation and value according to which what is fundamentally valuable and what ultimately motivates us is pleasure and pain. Happiness, according to Bentham, is thus a matter of experiencing pleasure and lack of pain.

Although he never practiced law, Bentham did write a great deal of philosophy of law, spending most of his life critiquing the existing law and strongly advocating legal reform. Throughout his work, he critiques various natural accounts of law which claim, for example, that liberty, rights, and so on exist independent of government. In this way, Bentham arguably developed an early form of what is now often called "legal positivism." Beyond such critiques, he ultimately maintained that putting his moral theory into consistent practice would yield results in legal theory by providing justification for social, political, and legal institutions.

Bentham's influence was minor during his life. But his impact was greater in later years as his ideas were carried on by followers such as John Stuart Mill, John Austin, and other consequentialists.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Method
  3. Human Nature
  4. Moral Philosophy
  5. Political Philosophy
    1. Law, Liberty and Government
    2. Rights
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Bentham's Works
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

A leading theorist in Anglo-American philosophy of law and one of the founders of utilitarianism, Jeremy Bentham was born in Houndsditch, London on February 15, 1748. He was the son and grandson of attorneys, and his early family life was colored by a mix of pious superstition (on his mother's side) and Enlightenment rationalism (from his father). Bentham lived during a time of major social, political and economic change. The Industrial Revolution (with the massive economic and social shifts that it brought in its wake), the rise of the middle class, and revolutions in France and America all were reflected in Bentham's reflections on existing institutions. In 1760, Bentham entered Queen's College, Oxford and, upon graduation in 1764, studied law at Lincoln's Inn. Though qualified to practice law, he never did so. Instead, he devoted most of his life to writing on matters of legal reform—though, curiously, he made little effort to publish much of what he wrote.

Bentham spent his time in intense study, often writing some eight to twelve hours a day. While most of his best known work deals with theoretical questions in law, Bentham was an active polemicist and was engaged for some time in developing projects that proposed various practical ideas for the reform of social institutions. Although his work came to have an important influence on political philosophy, Bentham did not write any single text giving the essential principles of his views on this topic. His most important theoretical work is the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1789), in which much of his moral theory—which he said reflected "the greatest happiness principle"—is described and developed.

In 1781, Bentham became associated with the Earl of Shelburne and, through him, came into contact with a number of the leading Whig politicians and lawyers. Although his work was admired by some at the time, Bentham's ideas were still largely unappreciated. In 1785, he briefly joined his brother Samuel in Russia, where he pursued his writing with even more than his usual intensity, and he devised a plan for the now infamous "Panopticon"—a model prison where all prisoners would be observable by (unseen) guards at all times—a project which he had hoped would interest the Czarina Catherine the Great. After his return to England in 1788, and for some 20 years thereafter, Bentham pursued—fruitlessly and at great expense—the idea of the panopticon. Fortunately, an inheritance received in 1796 provided him with financial stability. By the late 1790s, Bentham's theoretical work came to have a more significant place in political reform. Still, his influence was, arguably, still greater on the continent. (Bentham was made an honorary citizen of the fledgling French Republic in 1792, and his The Theory of Legislation was published first, in French, by his Swiss disciple, Etienne Dumont, in 1802.)

The precise extent of Bentham's influence in British politics has been a matter of some debate. While he attacked both Tory and Whig policies, both the Reform Bill of 1832 (promoted by Bentham's disciple, Lord Henry Brougham) and later reforms in the century (such as the secret ballot, advocated by Bentham's friend, George Grote, who was elected to parliament in 1832) reflected Benthamite concerns. The impact of Bentham's ideas goes further still. Contemporary philosophical and economic vocabulary (for example, "international," "maximize," "minimize," and "codification") is indebted to Bentham's proclivity for inventing terms, and among his other disciples were James Mill and his son, John (who was responsible for an early edition of some of Bentham's manuscripts), as well as the legal theorist, John Austin.

At his death in London, on June 6, 1832, Bentham left literally tens of thousands of manuscript pages—some of which was work only sketched out, but all of which he hoped would be prepared for publication. He also left a large estate, which was used to finance the newly-established University College, London (for those individuals excluded from university education—that is, non-conformists, Catholics and Jews), and his cadaver, per his instructions, was dissected, embalmed, dressed, and placed in a chair, and to this day resides in a cabinet in a corridor of the main building of University College. The Bentham Project, set up in the early 1960s at University College, has as its aim the publishing of a definitive, scholarly edition of Bentham's works and correspondence.

2. Method

Influenced by the philosophes of the Enlightenment (such as Beccaria, Helvétius, Diderot, D'Alembert, and Voltaire) and also by Locke and Hume, Bentham's work combined an empiricist approach with a rationalism that emphasized conceptual clarity and deductive argument. Locke's influence was primarily as the author of the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, and Bentham saw in him a model of one who emphasized the importance of reason over custom and tradition and who insisted on precision in the use of terms. Hume's influence was not so much on Bentham's method as on his account of the underlying principles of psychological associationism and on his articulation of the principle of utility, which was then still often annexed to theological views.

Bentham's analytical and empirical method is especially obvious when one looks at some of his main criticisms of the law and of moral and political discourse in general. His principal target was the presence of "fictions"—in particular, legal fictions. On his view, to consider any part or aspect of a thing in abstraction from that thing is to run the risk of confusion or to cause positive deceit. While, in some cases, such "fictional" terms as "relation," "right," "power," and "possession" were of some use, in many cases their original warrant had been forgotten, so that they survived as the product of either prejudice or inattention. In those cases where the terms could be "cashed out" in terms of the properties of real things, they could continue to be used, but otherwise they were to be abandoned. Still, Bentham hoped to eliminate legal fictions as far as possible from the law, including the legal fiction that there was some original contract that explained why there was any law at all. He thought that, at the very least, clarifications and justifications could be given that avoided the use of such terms.

3. Human Nature

For Bentham, morals and legislation can be described scientifically, but such a description requires an account of human nature. Just as nature is explained through reference to the laws of physics, so human behavior can be explained by reference to the two primary motives of pleasure and pain; this is the theory of psychological hedonism.

There is, Bentham admits, no direct proof of such an analysis of human motivation—though he holds that it is clear that, in acting, all people implicitly refer to it. At the beginning of the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, Bentham writes:

Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne. They govern us in all we do, in all we say, in all we think: every effort we can make to throw off our subjection, will serve but to demonstrate and confirm it. (Ch. 1)

From this we see that, for Bentham, pleasure and pain serve not only as explanations for action, but they also define one's good. It is, in short, on the basis of pleasures and pains, which can exist only in individuals, that Bentham thought one could construct a calculus of value.

Related to this fundamental hedonism is a view of the individual as exhibiting a natural, rational self-interest—a form of psychological egoism. In his "Remarks on Bentham's Philosophy" (1833), Mill cites Bentham's The Book of Fallacies (London: Hunt, 1824, pp. 392-3) that "[i]n every human breast... self-regarding interest is predominant over social interest; each person's own individual interest over the interests of all other persons taken together." Fundamental to the nature and activity of individuals, then, is their own well-being, and reason—as a natural capability of the person—is considered to be subservient to this end.

Bentham believed that the nature of the human person can be adequately described without mention of social relationships. To begin with, the idea of "relation" is but a "fictitious entity," though necessary for "convenience of discourse." And, more specifically, he remarks that "the community is a fictitious body," and it is but "the sum of the interests of the several members who compose it." Thus, the extension of the term "individual" is, in the main, no greater and no less than the biological entity. Bentham's view, then, is that the individual—the basic unit of the social sphere—is an "atom" and there is no "self" or "individual" greater than the human individual. A person's relations with others—even if important—are not essential and describe nothing that is, strictly speaking, necessary to its being what it is.

Finally, the picture of the human person presented by Bentham is based on a psychological associationism indebted to David Hartley and Hume; Bentham's analysis of "habit" (which is essential to his understanding of society and especially political society) particularly reflects associationist presuppositions. On this view, pleasure and pain are objective states and can be measured in terms of their intensity, duration, certainty, proximity, fecundity and purity. This allows both for an objective determination of an activity or state and for a comparison with others.

Bentham's understanding of human nature reveals, in short, a psychological, ontological, and also moral individualism where, to extend the critique of utilitarianism made by Graeme Duncan and John Gray (1979), "the individual human being is conceived as the source of values and as himself the supreme value."

4. Moral Philosophy

As Elie Halévy (1904) notes, there are three principal characteristics of which constitute the basis of Bentham's moral and political philosophy: (i) the greatest happiness principle, (ii) universal egoism and (iii) the artificial identification of one's interests with those of others. Though these characteristics are present throughout his work, they are particularly evident in the Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, where Bentham is concerned with articulating rational principles that would provide a basis and guide for legal, social and moral reform.

To begin with, Bentham's moral philosophy reflects what he calls at different times "the greatest happiness principle" or "the principle of utility"—a term which he borrows from Hume. In adverting to this principle, however, he was not referring to just the usefulness of things or actions, but to the extent to which these things or actions promote the general happiness. Specifically, then, what is morally obligatory is that which produces the greatest amount of happiness for the greatest number of people, happiness being determined by reference to the presence of pleasure and the absence of pain. Thus, Bentham writes, "By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question: or, what is the same thing in other words, to promote or to oppose that happiness." And Bentham emphasizes that this applies to "every action whatsoever" (Ch. 1). That which does not maximize the greatest happiness (such as an act of pure ascetic sacrifice) is, therefore, morally wrong. (Unlike some of the previous attempts at articulating a universal hedonism, Bentham's approach is thoroughly naturalistic.)

Bentham's moral philosophy, then, clearly reflects his psychological view that the primary motivators in human beings are pleasure and pain. Bentham admits that his version of the principle of utility is something that does not admit of direct proof, but he notes that this is not a problem as some explanatory principles do not admit of any such proof and all explanation must start somewhere. But this, by itself, does not explain why another's happiness—or the general happiness—should count. And, in fact, he provides a number of suggestions that could serve as answers to the question of why we should be concerned with the happiness of others.

First, Bentham says, the principle of utility is something to which individuals, in acting, refer either explicitly or implicitly, and this is something that can be ascertained and confirmed by simple observation. Indeed, Bentham held that all existing systems of morality can be "reduced to the principles of sympathy and antipathy," which is precisely that which defines utility. A second argument found in Bentham is that, if pleasure is the good, then it is good irrespective of whose pleasure it is. Thus, a moral injunction to pursue or maximize pleasure has force independently of the specific interests of the person acting. Bentham also suggests that individuals would reasonably seek the general happiness simply because the interests of others are inextricably bound up with their own, though he recognized that this is something that is easy for individuals to ignore. Nevertheless, Bentham envisages a solution to this as well. Specifically, he proposes that making this identification of interests obvious and, when necessary, bringing diverse interests together would be the responsibility of the legislator.

Finally, Bentham held that there are advantages to a moral philosophy based on a principle of utility. To begin with, the principle of utility is clear (compared to other moral principles), allows for objective and disinterested public discussion, and enables decisions to be made where there seem to be conflicts of (prima facie) legitimate interests. Moreover, in calculating the pleasures and pains involved in carrying out a course of action (the "hedonic calculus"), there is a fundamental commitment to human equality. The principle of utility presupposes that "one man is worth just the same as another man" and so there is a guarantee that in calculating the greatest happiness "each person is to count for one and no one for more than one."

For Bentham, then, there is no inconsistency between the greatest happiness principle and his psychological hedonism and egoism. Thus, he writes that moral philosophy or ethics can be simply described as "the art of directing men's action to the production of the greatest possible quantity of happiness, on the part of those whose interest is in view."

5. Political Philosophy

Bentham was regarded as the central figure of a group of intellectuals called, by Elie Halévy (1904), "the philosophic radicals," of which both Mill and Herbert Spencer can be counted among the "spiritual descendants." While it would be too strong to claim that the ideas of the philosophic radicals reflected a common political theory, it is nevertheless correct to say that they agreed that many of the social problems of late eighteenth and early nineteenth century England were due to an antiquated legal system and to the control of the economy by a hereditary landed gentry opposed to modern capitalist institutions. As discussed in the preceding section, for Bentham, the principles that govern morals also govern politics and law, and political reform requires a clear understanding of human nature. While he develops a number of principles already present in Anglo-Saxon political philosophy, he breaks with that tradition in significant ways.

In his earliest work, A Fragment on Government (1776), which is an excerpt from a longer work published only in 1928 as Comment on Blackstone's Commentaries, Bentham attacked the legal theory of Sir William Blackstone. Bentham's target was, primarily, Blackstone's defense of tradition in law. Bentham advocated the rational revision of the legal system, a restructuring of the process of determining responsibility and of punishment, and a more extensive freedom of contract. This, he believed, would favor not only the development of the community, but the personal development of the individual.

Bentham's attack on Blackstone targeted more than the latter's use of tradition however. Against Blackstone and a number of earlier thinkers (including Locke), Bentham repudiated many of the concepts underlying their political philosophies, such as natural right, state of nature, and social contract. Bentham then attempted to outline positive alternatives to the preceding "traditionalisms." Not only did he work to reform and restructure existing institutions, but he promoted broader suffrage and self (that is, representative) government.

a. Law, Liberty and Government

The notion of liberty present in Bentham's account is what is now generally referred to as "negative" liberty—freedom from external restraint or compulsion. Bentham says that "[l]iberty is the absence of restraint" and so, to the extent that one is not hindered by others, one has liberty and is "free." Bentham denies that liberty is "natural" (in the sense of existing "prior to" social life and thereby imposing limits on the state) or that there is an a priori sphere of liberty in which the individual is sovereign. In fact, Bentham holds that people have always lived in society, and so there can be no state of nature (though he does distinguish between political society and "natural society") and no "social contract" (a notion which he held was not only unhistorical but pernicious). Nevertheless, he does note that there is an important distinction between one's public and private life that has morally significant consequences, and he holds that liberty is a good—that, even though it is not something that is a fundamental value, it reflects the greatest happiness principle.

Correlative with this account of liberty, Bentham (as Thomas Hobbes before him) viewed law as "negative." Given that pleasure and pain are fundamental to—indeed, provide—the standard of value for Bentham, liberty is a good (because it is "pleasant") and the restriction of liberty is an evil (because it is "painful"). Law, which is by its very nature a restriction of liberty and painful to those whose freedom is restricted, is a prima facie evil. It is only so far as control by the state is limited that the individual is free. Law is, Bentham recognized, necessary to social order and good laws are clearly essential to good government. Indeed, perhaps more than Locke, Bentham saw the positive role to be played by law and government, particularly in achieving community well-being. To the extent that law advances and protects one's economic and personal goods and that what government exists is self-government, law reflects the interests of the individual.

Unlike many earlier thinkers, Bentham held that law is not rooted in a "natural law" but is simply a command expressing the will of the sovereign. (This account of law, later developed by Austin, is characteristic of legal positivism.) Thus, a law that commands morally questionable or morally evil actions, or that is not based on consent, is still law.

b. Rights

Bentham's views on rights are, perhaps, best known through the attacks on the concept of "natural rights" that appear throughout his work. These criticisms are especially developed in his Anarchical Fallacies (a polemical attack on the declarations of rights issued in France during the French Revolution), written between 1791 and 1795 but not published until 1816, in French. Bentham's criticisms here are rooted in his understanding of the nature of law. Rights are created by the law, and law is simply a command of the sovereign. The existence of law and rights, therefore, requires government. Rights are also usually (though not necessarily) correlative with duties determined by the law and, as in Hobbes, are either those which the law explicitly gives us or those within a legal system where the law is silent. The view that there could be rights not based on sovereign command and which pre-exist the establishment of government is rejected.

According to Bentham, then, the term "natural right" is a "perversion of language." It is "ambiguous," "sentimental" and "figurative" and it has anarchical consequences. At best, such a "right" may tell us what we ought to do; it cannot serve as a legal restriction on what we can or cannot do. The term "natural right" is ambiguous, Bentham says, because it suggests that there are general rights—that is, rights over no specific object—so that one would have a claim on whatever one chooses. The effect of exercising such a universal, natural "right" would be to extinguish the right altogether, since "what is every man's right is no man's right." No legal system could function with such a broad conception of rights. Thus, there cannot be any general rights in the sense suggested by the French declarations.

Moreover, the notion of natural rights is figurative. Properly speaking, there are no rights anterior to government. The assumption of the existence of such rights, Bentham says, seems to be derived from the theory of the social contract. Here, individuals form a society and choose a government through the alienation of certain of their rights. But such a doctrine is not only unhistorical, according to Bentham, it does not even serve as a useful fiction to explain the origin of political authority. Governments arise by habit or by force, and for contracts (and, specifically, some original contract) to bind, there must already be a government in place to enforce them.

Finally, the idea of a natural right is "anarchical." Such a right, Bentham claims, entails a freedom from all restraint and, in particular, from all legal restraint. Since a natural right would be anterior to law, it could not be limited by law, and (since human beings are motivated by self-interest) if everyone had such freedom, the result would be pure anarchy. To have a right in any meaningful sense entails that others cannot legitimately interfere with one's rights, and this implies that rights must be capable of enforcement. Such restriction, as noted earlier, is the province of the law.

Bentham concludes, therefore, that the term "natural rights" is "simple nonsense: natural and imprescriptible rights, rhetorical nonsense,—nonsense upon stilts." Rights—what Bentham calls "real" rights—are fundamentally legal rights. All rights must be legal and specific (that is, having both a specific object and subject). They ought to be made because of their conduciveness to "the general mass of felicity," and correlatively, when their abolition would be to the advantage of society, rights ought to be abolished. So far as rights exist in law, they are protected; outside of law, they are at best "reasons for wishing there were such things as rights." While Bentham's essays against natural rights are largely polemical, many of his objections continue to be influential in contemporary political philosophy.

Nevertheless, Bentham did not dismiss talk of rights altogether. There are some services that are essential to the happiness of human beings and that cannot be left to others to fulfill as they see fit, and so these individuals must be compelled, on pain of punishment, to fulfill them. They must, in other words, respect the rights of others. Thus, although Bentham was generally suspicious of the concept of rights, he does allow that the term is useful, and in such work as A General View of a Complete Code of Laws, he enumerates a large number of rights. While the meaning he assigns to these rights is largely stipulative rather than descriptive, they clearly reflect principles defended throughout his work.

There has been some debate over the extent to which the rights that Bentham defends are based on or reducible to duties or obligations, whether he can consistently maintain that such duties or obligations are based on the principle of utility, and whether the existence of what Bentham calls "permissive rights"—rights one has where the law is silent—is consistent with his general utilitarian view. This latter point has been discussed at length by H.L.A. Hart (1973) and David Lyons (1969).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Bentham's Works

The standard edition of Bentham's writings is The Works of Jeremy Bentham, (ed. John Bowring), London, 1838-1843; Reprinted New York, 1962. The contents are as follows:

  • Volume 1: Introduction; An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation; Essay on the Promulgation of Laws, Essay on the Influence of Time and Place in Matters of Legislation, A Table of the Springs of Action, A Fragment on Government: or A Comment on the Commentaries; Principles of the Civil Code; Principles of Penal Law
  • Volume 2: Principles of Judicial Procedure, with the outlines of a Procedural Code; The Rationale of Reward; Leading Principles of a Constitutional Code, for any state; On the Liberty of the Press, and public discussion; The Book of Fallacies, from unfinished papers; Anarchical Fallacies; Principles of International Law; A Protest Against Law Taxes; Supply without Burden; Tax with Monopoly
  • Volume 3: Defence of Usury; A Manual of Political Economy; Observations on the Restrictive and Prohibitory Commercial System; A Plan for saving all trouble and expense in the transfer of stock; A General View of a Complete Code of Laws; Pannomial Fragments; Nomography, or the art of inditing laws; Equal Dispatch Court Bill; Plan of Parliamentary Reform, in the form of a catechism; Radical Reform Bill; Radicalism Not Dangerous
  • Volume 4: A View of the Hard Labour Bill; Panopticon, or, the inspection house; Panopticon versus New South Wales; A Plea for the Constitution; Draught of a Code for the Organisation of Judicial Establishment in France; Bentham's Draught for the Organisation of Judicial Establishments, compared with that of a national assembly; Emancipate Your Colonies; Jeremy Bentham to his Fellow Citizens of France, on houses of peers and Senates; Papers Relative to Codification and Public Instruction; Codification Proposal
  • Volume 5: Scotch Reform; Summary View of the Plan of a Judiciary, under the name of the court of lord's delegates; The Elements of the Art of Packing; "Swear Not At All"; Truth versus Ashhurst; The King against Edmonds and Others; The King against Sir Charles Wolseley and Joseph Harrison; Optical Aptitude Maximized, Expense Minimized; A Commentary on Mr Humphreys' Real Property Code; Outline of a Plan of a General Register of Real Property; Justice and Codification Petitions; Lord Brougham Displayed
  • Volume 6: An Introductory View of the Rationale of Evidence; Rationale of Judicial Evidence, specially applied to English Practice, Books I-IV
  • Volume 7: Rationale of Judicial Evidence, specially applied to English Practice, Books V-X
  • Volume 8: Chrestomathia; A Fragment on Ontology; Essay on Logic; Essay on Language; Fragments on Universal Grammar; Tracts on Poor Laws and Pauper Management; Observations on the Poor Bill; Three Tracts Relative to Spanish and Portuguese Affairs; Letters to Count Toreno, on the proposed penal code; Securities against Misrule
  • Volume 9: The Constitutional Code
  • Volume 10: Memoirs of Bentham, Chapters I-XXII
  • Volume 11: Memoirs of Bentham, Chapters XXIII-XXVI; Analytical Index

A new edition of Bentham's Works is being prepared by The Bentham Project at University College, University of London. This edition includes:

  • The Correspondence of Jeremy Bentham, Ed. Timothy L. S. Sprigge, 10 vols., London : Athlone Press, 1968-1984. [Vol. 3 edited by I.R. Christie; Vol. 4-5 edited by Alexander Taylor Milne; Vol. 6-7 edited by J.R. Dinwiddy; Vol. 8 edited by Stephen Conway].
  • An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, Ed. J.H. Burns and H.L.A. Hart, London: The Athlone Press, 1970.
  • Of Laws in General. London: Athlone Press, 1970.
  • A Comment on the Commentaries and a Fragment on Government, Ed. J.H. Burns and H.L.A. Hart, London: The Athlone Press, 1977.
  • Chrestomathia, Ed. M. J. Smith, and W. H. Burston, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press ; Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Deontology ; together with A Table of the Springs of Action ; and the Article on Utilitarianism. Ed. Amnon Goldworth, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press ; Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Constitutional Code : vol. I . Ed. F. Rosen and J. H. Burns, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press; Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Securities Against Misrule and Other Constitutional Writings for Tripoli and Greece. Ed. Philip Schofield, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press ; Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Official Aptitude Maximized : Expense Minimized. Ed. Philip Schofield, Oxford : Clarendon Press, 1993.
  • Colonies, Commerce, and Constitutional Law : Rid Yourselves of Ultramaria and Other Writings on Spain and Spanish America. Ed. Philip Schofield, Oxford/New York : Clarendon Press ; Oxford University Press, 1995.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Duncan, Graeme & Gray, John. "The Left Against Mill," in New Essays on John Stuart Mill and Utilitarianism, Eds. Wesley E. Cooper, Kai Nielsen and Steven C. Patten, 1979.
  • Halévy, Elie. La formation du radicalisme philosophique, 3 vols. Paris, 1904 [The Growth of Philosophic Radicalism. Tr. Mary Morris. London: Faber & Faber, 1928.]
  • Harrison, Ross. Bentham. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1983.
  • Hart, H.L.A. "Bentham on Legal Rights," in Oxford Essays in Jurisprudence (second series), ed. A.W.B. Simpson (Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1973), pp. 171-201.
  • Lyons, David. "Rights, Claimants and Beneficiaries," in American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 6 (1969), pp. 173-185.
  • MacCunn, John. Six Radical Thinkers, second impression, London, 1910.
  • Mack, Mary Peter. Jeremy Bentham: An Odyssey of Ideas 1748-1792. London: Heinemann, 1962.
  • Manning, D.J. The Mind of Jeremy Bentham, London: Longmans, 1968.
  • Plamenatz, John. The English Utilitarians. Oxford, 1949.
  • Stephen, Leslie. The English Utilitarians. 3 vols., London: Duckworth, 1900.

Author Information

William Sweet
St. Francis Xavier University

Mill, John Stuart

John Stuart Mill (1806—1873)

millJohn Stuart Mill (1806-1873) profoundly influenced the shape of nineteenth century British thought and political discourse. His substantial corpus of works includes texts in logic, epistemology, economics, social and political philosophy, ethics, metaphysics, religion, and current affairs. Among his most well-known and significant are A System of Logic, Principles of Political Economy, On Liberty, Utilitarianism, The Subjection of Women, Three Essays on Religion, and his Autobiography.Mill’s education at the hands of his imposing father, James Mill, fostered both intellectual development (Greek at the age of three, Latin at eight) and a propensity towards reform. James Mill and Jeremy Bentham led the “Philosophic Radicals,” who advocated for rationalization of the law and legal institutions, universal male suffrage, the use of economic theory in political decision-making, and a politics oriented by human happiness rather than natural rights or conservatism. In his twenties, the younger Mill felt the influence of historicism, French social thought, and Romanticism, in the form of thinkers like Coleridge, the St. Simonians, Thomas Carlyle, Goethe, and Wordsworth. This led him to begin searching for a new philosophic radicalism that would be more sensitive to the limits on reform imposed by culture and history and would emphasize the cultivation of our humanity, including the cultivation of dispositions of feeling and imagination (something he thought had been lacking in his own education).

None of Mill’s major writings remain independent of his moral, political, and social agenda. Even the most abstract works, such as the System of Logic and his Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, serve polemical purposes in the fight against the German, or a priori, school otherwise called “intuitionism.” On Mill’s view, intuitionism needed to be defeated in the realms of logic, mathematics, and philosophy of mind if its pernicious effects in social and political discourse were to be mitigated.

In his writings, Mill argues for a number of controversial principles. He defends radical empiricism in logic and mathematics, suggesting that basic principles of logic and mathematics are generalizations from experience rather than known a priori. The principle of utility—that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness”—was the centerpiece of his ethical philosophy. On Liberty puts forward the “harm principle” that “the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others.” In The Subjection of Women, he compares the legal status of women to the status of slaves and argues for equality in marriage and under the law.

This article provides an overview of Mill’s life and major works, focusing on his key arguments and their relevant historical contexts.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
    1. A System of Logic
      1. Names, Propositions, and the Principles of Logic and Mathematics
      2. Other Topics of Interest
    2. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy
    3. Psychological Writings
    4. Utilitarianism
      1. History of the Principle of Utility
      2. Basic Argument
    5. On Liberty
    6. The Subjection of Women and Other Social and Political Writings
    7. Principles of Political Economy
    8. Essays on Religion
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Writing of John Stuart Mill a few days after Mill’s death, Henry Sidgwick claimed, “I should say that from about 1860-65 or thereabouts he ruled England in the region of thought as very few men ever did: I do not expect to see anything like it again.” (Collini 1991, 178). Mill established this rule over English thought through his writings in logic, epistemology, economics, social and political philosophy, ethics, metaphysics, religion, and current affairs. One can say with relative security, looking at the breadth and complexity of his work, that Mill was the greatest nineteenth century British philosopher.

This rule did not come about accidentally. It had been planned by his father James Mill from the younger Mill’s birth on May 20, 1806. The elder Mill was a towering figure for his eldest child, and Mill’s story must be told through his father’s. James Mill was born in Scotland in 1773 to a family of modest means. Through the patronage of Sir John and Lady Jane Stuart, he was able to attend the University of Edinburgh, which at the time was one of the finest universities in Europe. He trained for the Presbyterian ministry under the auspices of admired teachers like Dugald Stewart, who was an effective popularizer of Thomas Reid’s philosophy.

After a brief and generally unsuccessful stint as a minister, James Mill moved to London, where he began his career in letters. This was a difficult path for a man of very modest resources to take; he and his wife Harriet (married 1805) lived without financial security for well over a decade. It was only with the publication of his The History of British India in 1818—a work that took twelve years to write—that Mill was able to land a stable, well paying job at the East India Company that enabled him to support his large family (ultimately consisting of his wife and nine children).

Throughout the years of relative poverty, James Mill received assistance from friends including the great legal theorist and utilitarian reformer Jeremy Bentham, whom he met in 1808. The two men helped lead the movement of “Philosophic Radicals” that gave intellectual heft to the British Radical party of the early to mid-nineteenth century. Among their colleagues were David Ricardo, George Grote, Sir William Molesworth, John Austin, and Francis Place.

This philosophically inspired radicalism of the early nineteenth century positioned itself against the Whigs and Tories. The Radicals advocated for legal and political reform, universal male suffrage, the use of economic theory (especially Ricardo’s) in political decision-making, and a politics oriented by human happiness rather than by conservatism or by natural rights (which Bentham famously derided as “nonsense upon stilts”). Moreover, one aspect of their political temperament that distinguished them from Whigs and Tories was their rationalism—their willingness to recommend re-structuring social and political institutions under the explicit guidance of principles of reason (e.g. the principle of utility).

With Bentham’s financial support, the Radicals founded the Westminster Review (1824) to counter the Whig Edinburgh Review (1802) and the Tory Quarterly Review (1809). While Whig intellectuals and Radicals tended to align with each other on economic issues, both tending towards pro-urban, pro-industrial, laissez-faire policies, Tory intellectuals focused on defending traditional British social structures and ways of life associated with aristocratic agrarianism. These alliances can be seen in disputes over the Tory-supported Corn Laws, legislation meant to protect domestic agriculture by taxing imported grains.

Though Whigs and Radicals were often allied (eventually forming the Liberal party in the 1840s), some of the most acrimonious political and intellectual rows of the period were over their differences (for example, Macaulay’s famous public disputes with James Mill over political theorizing). James Mill saw the Whigs as too imbued with aristocratic interests to be a true organ of democratic reform. Only the Radicals could properly advocate for the middle and working classes. Moreover, unlike the Radicals, who possessed a systematic politics guided by the principle of utility (the principle that set the promotion of aggregate happiness as the standard for legislation and action), the Whigs lacked a systematic politics. The Whigs depended instead on a loose empiricism, which the senior Mill took as an invitation to complacency. Whigs, alternatively, took exception to the rationalistic tenor of the Radicals’ politics, seeing in it a dangerous psychological and historical naiveté. They also reacted to the extremity of the Radicals’ reformist temperaments, which revealed hostility to the Anglican church and to religion more generally.

The younger Mill was seen as the crown prince of the Philosophic Radical movement and his famous education reflected the hopes of his father and Bentham. Under the dominating gaze of his father, he was taught Greek beginning at age three and Latin at eight. He read histories, many of the Greek and Roman classics, and Newton by eleven. He studied logic and math, moving to political economy and legal philosophy in his early teens, and then went on to metaphysics. His training facilitated active command of the material through the requirement that he teach his younger siblings and through evening walks with his father when the precocious pupil would have to tell his father what he had learned that day. His year in France in 1820 led to a fluency in French and initiated his life-long interest in French thought and politics. As he matured, his father and Bentham both employed him as an editor. In addition, he founded a number of intellectual societies and study groups and began to contribute to periodicals, including the Westminster Review.

The stress of his education and of his youthful activity combined with other factors to lead to what he later termed, in his Autobiography, his “mental crisis” of 1826. There have been a wide variety of attempts to explain what led to this crisis—most of which center around his relation to his demanding father—but what matters most about the crisis is that it represents the beginning of Mill’s struggle to revise his father’s and Bentham’s thought, which he grew to think of as limited in a number of ways. Mill claims that he began to come out of his depression with the help of poetry (specifically Wordsworth). This contributed to his sense that while his education had fostered his analytic abilities, it had left his capacity for feeling underdeveloped. This realization made him re-think the attachment to the radical, rationalistic strands of Enlightenment thought that his education was meant to promote.

In response to this crisis, Mill began exploring Romanticism and a variety of other European intellectual movements that rejected secular, naturalistic, worldly conceptions of human nature. He also became interested in criticisms of urbanization and industrialization. These explorations were furthered by the writings of (and frequent correspondence with) thinkers from a wide sampling of intellectual traditions, including Thomas Carlyle, Auguste Comte, Alexis de Tocqueville, John Ruskin, M. Gustave d’Eichtal (and other St. Simonians), Herbert Spencer, Frederick Maurice, and John Sterling.

The attempt to rectify the perceived deficiencies of the Philosophic Radicals through engagement with other styles of thought began with Mill’s editing of a new journal, the London Review, founded by the two Mills and Charles Molesworth. Molesworth quickly bought out the old Westminster Review in 1834, to leave the new London and Westminster Review as the unopposed voice of the radicals. With James Mill’s death in 1836 and Bentham’s 1832 demise, Mill had more intellectual freedom. He used that freedom to forge a new “philosophic radicalism” that incorporated the insights of thinkers like Coleridge and Thomas Carlyle. (Collected Works [CW], I.209). One of his principal goals was “to shew that there was a Radical philosophy, better and more complete than Bentham’s, while recognizing and incorporating all of Bentham’s which is permanently valuable.” (CW, I.221).

This project is perhaps best indicated by Mill’s well-known essays of 1838 and 1840 on Bentham and Coleridge, which were published in the London and Westminster Review. Mill suggested that Bentham and Coleridge were “the two great seminal minds of England in their age” and used each essay to show their strengths and weaknesses, implying that a more complete philosophical position remained open for articulation. Mill would spend his career attempting to carry that out.

Harriet Taylor, friend, advisor, and eventual wife, helped him with this project. He met Taylor in 1830 and she was to join James Mill as one of the two most important people in Mill’s life. Unfortunately for Mill, Taylor was married. After two decades of an intense and somewhat scandalous platonic relationship, they were married in 1851 after her husband’s death. Her death in 1858 left him inconsolable.

There has been substantial debate about the nature and extent of Harriet Taylor’s influence on Mill. Beyond question is that Mill found in her a partner, friend, critic, and someone who encouraged him. Mill was probably most swayed by her in the realms of political, ethical, and social thought, but less so in the areas of logic and political economy (with the possible exception of his views on socialism).

Mill’s day-to-day existence was dominated by his work at the East India Company, though his job required little time, paid him well, and left him ample opportunity for writing. He began there in 1826, working under his father, and by his retirement in 1857, he held the same position as his father, chief examiner, which put him in charge of the memoranda guiding the company’s policies in India.

On his retirement and after the death of his wife, Mill was recruited to stand for a Parliamentary seat. Though he was not particularly effective during his one term as an MP, he participated in three dramatic events. (Capaldi 2004, 326-7). First, Mill attempted to amend the 1867 Reform Bill to substitute “person” for “man” so that the franchise would be extended to women. Though the effort failed, it generated momentum for women’s suffrage. Second, he headed the Jamaica Committee, which pushed (unsuccessfully) for the prosecution of Governor Eyre of Jamaica, who had imposed brutal martial law after an uprising by blacks. Third, Mill used his influence with the leaders of the laboring classes to defuse a potentially dangerous confrontation between government troops and workers who were protesting the defeat of the 1866 Reform Bill.

After his term in Parliament ended and he was not re-elected, Mill began spending more time in France, writing, walking, and living with his wife’s daughter, Helen Taylor. It was to her that he uttered his last words in 1873, “You know that I have done my work.” He was buried next to his wife, Harriet.

Though Mill’s influence has waxed and waned since his death, his writings in ethics and social and political philosophy continue to be read most often. Many of his texts—particularly On Liberty, Utilitarianism, The Subjection of Women, and his Autobiography—continue to be reprinted and taught in universities throughout the world.

2. Works

Mill wrote on a startling number of topics. All his major texts, however, play a role in defending his new philosophic radicalism and the intellectual, moral, political, and social agendas associated with it.

a. A System of Logic

Though Mill’s biography reveals his openness to intellectual exploration, his most basic philosophical commitment—to naturalism—never seriously wavers. He is committed to the idea that our best methods of explaining the world are those employed by the natural sciences. Anything that we can know about human minds and wills comes from treating them as part of the causal order investigated by the sciences, rather than as special entities that lie outside it.

By taking the methods of the natural sciences as the only route to knowledge about the world, Mill sees himself as rejecting the “German, or a priori view of human knowledge,” (CW, I.233) or, as he also calls it, “intuitionism,” which was espoused in different ways by Kant, Reid, and their followers in Britain (e.g. Whewell and Hamilton). Though there are many differences among intuitionist thinkers, one “grand doctrine” that Mill suggests they all affirm is the view that “the constitution of the mind is the key to the constitution of external nature—that the laws of the human intellect have a necessary correspondence with the objective laws of the universe, such that these may be inferred from those.” (CW, XI.343). The intuitionist doctrine conceives of nature as being largely or wholly constituted by the mind rather than more or less imperfectly observed by it. One of the great dangers presented by this doctrine, from the perspective of Mill’s a posteriori school, is that it supports the belief that one can know universal truths about the world through evidence (including intuitions or Kantian categories of the understanding) provided by the mind alone rather than by nature. If the mind constitutes the world that we experience, then we can understand the world by understanding the mind. It was this freedom from appeal to nature and the lack of independent (i.e. empirical) checks to the knowledge claims associated with it that Mill found so disturbing.

For Mill, the problems with intuitionism extend far beyond the metaphysical and epistemological to the moral and political. As Mill says in his Autobiography when discussing his important treatise of 1843, A System of Logic:

The notion that truths external to the mind may be known by intuition or consciousness, independently of observation and experience, is, I am persuaded, in these times, the great intellectual support of false doctrines and bad institutions. By the aid of this theory, every inveterate belief and every intense feeling, of which the origin is not remembered, is enabled to dispense with the obligation of justifying itself by reason, and is erected into its own all-sufficient voucher and justification. There never was such an instrument devised for consecrating all deep-seated prejudices. And the chief strength of this false philosophy in morals, politics, and religion, lies in the appeal which it is accustomed to make to the evidence of mathematics and of the cognate branches of physical science. To expel it from these, is to drive it from its stronghold. (CW, I.233)

This charge against intuitionism, that it frees one from the obligation of justifying one’s beliefs, has strong roots in philosophic radicalism. We find Bentham, in his 1789 An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, attacking non-utilitarian moral systems for just this reason: “They consist all of them in so many contrivances for avoiding the obligation of appealing to any external standard, and for prevailing upon the reader to accept of the author’s sentiment or opinion as a reason and that a sufficient one for itself.” (IPML, II.14). Mill thus saw his own commitment to the naturalism and empiricism of the “a posteriori school” of thought as part of a broader social and political agenda that advocated for reform and also undercut traditional foundations of conservatism.

Intuitionism, however, is often taken to be on much firmer ground than empiricism when it comes to accounting for our knowledge of mathematics and logic. This is especially true if one rejects the idea, found in people like Hobbes and Hume, that mathematical propositions like 2 + 3 = 5 are true merely because of the meaning of the constituents of the proposition, or, as Hume puts it, because of the proposition’s “relations of ideas.” Mill agrees with those (including Kant) who maintain that logical and mathematical truths are not merely linguistic—that they contain substantive, non-linguistic information. But this leaves Mill with the problem of accounting for the apparent necessity of such truths—a necessity which seems to rule out their origin in experience. To successfully attack intuitionism in “its stronghold,” the System of Logic needs to provide alternative grounds for basic principles of logic and mathematics (e.g. the principle of non-contradiction). In particular, Mill needs to show how “that peculiar character of what are called necessary truths” may be explained from experience and association alone.

The object of logic “is to ascertain how we come by that portion of our knowledge (much the greatest portion) which is not intuitive: and by what criterion we can, in matters not self-evident, distinguish between things proved and things not proved, between what is worthy and what is unworthy of belief.” (A System of Logic [System], I.i.1). It should be noted that logic goes beyond formal logic for Mill and into the conditions of truth more generally.

The text has the following basic structure. Book I addresses names and propositions. Books II and III examine deduction and induction, respectively. Book IV discusses a variety of operations of the mind, including observation, abstraction and naming, which are presupposed in all induction or instrumental to more complicated forms of induction. Book V reveals fallacies of reasoning. Finally, in Book VI, Mill treats the “moral sciences” and argues for the fundamental similarity of the methods of the natural and human sciences. In fact, the human sciences can be understood as themselves natural sciences with human objects of study.

i. Names, Propositions, and the Principles of Logic and Mathematics

Mill’s argument that the principles of mathematics and logic are justified by appeal to experience depends upon his distinction between verbal and real propositions, that is, between propositions that do not convey new information to the person who understands the meaning of the proposition’s terms and those propositions that do convey new information. The point of the distinction between verbal and real propositions is, first, to stress that all real propositions are a posteriori. Second, the distinction emphasizes that verbal propositions are empty of content; they tell us about language (i.e. what words mean) rather than about the world. In Kantian terms, Mill wants to deny the possibility of synthetic a priori propositions, while contending that we can still make sense of our knowledge of subjects like logic and mathematics.

This distinction between verbal and real propositions depends, in turn, upon Mill’s analysis of the meaning of propositions, i.e. how the meanings of constituents of propositions determine the meaning of the whole. A proposition, in which something is affirmed or denied of something, is formed by putting together two “names” or terms (subject and predicate) and a copula. The subject is the name “denoting the person or thing which something is affirmed or denied of.” (System, I.i.2). The predicate is “the name denoting that which is affirmed or denied.” The copula is “the sign denoting that there is an affirmation or denial,” which thereby enables “the hearer or reader to distinguish a proposition from any other kind of discourse.” In the proposition ‘gold is yellow’ for example, the copula ‘is’ shows that the quality yellow is being affirmed of the substance gold.

Mill divides names into general and singular names. All names, except proper names (e.g. Ringo, Buckley, etc) and names that signify an attribute only (e.g. whiteness, length), have a connotation and a denotation. That is, they both connote or imply some attribute(s) and denote or pick out individuals that fall under that description. The general name “man,” for example, denotes Socrates, Picasso, Plutarch and an indefinite number of other individuals, and it does so because they all share some attribute(s) (e.g. rational animal, featherless biped, etc.) connoted by man. The name “white” denotes all white things and implies or connotes the attribute whiteness. The word “whiteness,” by contrast, denotes or signifies an attribute but does not connote an attribute. Instead, it operates like a proper name in that its meaning derives entirely from what it denotes.

The meaning of a typical proposition is that the thing(s) denoted by the subject has the attribute(s) connoted by the predicate. In sentences like “Eleanor is tired” and “All men are mortal,” though the subjects pick out their objects differently (through a proper name and through an attribute, respectively), Mill’s basic story about the meaning of propositions holds.

Things become much more difficult with identity statements like “Hesperus is Phosphorus.” In this case, we have two proper names that pick out the same object (the planet Venus). Under Mill’s view, these proper names should have the same meaning because they denote the same object. But this appears untenable because the statement seems informative. It doesn’t seem plausible that the proposition merely states that an object is identical with itself, which would be the proposition’s meaning if Mill’s views on the meaning of proper names were correct. (See Frege and Russell’s attack on Mill’s account of the meaning of proper names; but see Kripke’s sophisticate defense of Mill on this in Naming and Necessity).

This discussion of the nature of names or terms enables us to understand Mill’s treatment of verbal and real propositions. Verbal propositions assert something about the meaning of names rather than about matters of fact. This means that, “(s)ince names and their signification are entirely arbitrary, such propositions are not, strictly speaking, susceptible of truth or falsity, but only of conformity or disconformity to usage or convention.” (System, This kind of proposition simply “asserts of a thing under a particular name, only what is asserted of it in the fact of calling it by that name; and which, therefore, either gives no information, or gives it respecting the name, not the thing.” ( As such, verbal propositions are empty of content and they are the only things we know a priori, independently of checking the correspondence of the proposition to the world.

Real propositions, in contrast, “predicate of a thing some fact not involved in the signification of the name by which the proposition speaks of it; some attribute not connoted by that name.” ( Such propositions convey information that is not already included in the names or terms employed, and their truth or falsity depends on whether or not they correspond to relevant features of the world. Thus, “George is on the soccer team” predicates something of the subject George that is not included in its meaning (in this case, the denotation of the individual person) and its being true or not depends upon whether George is, in fact, on the team.

Mill’s great contention in the System of Logic is that logic and mathematics contain real, rather than merely verbal, propositions. He claims, for example, that the law of contradiction (i.e. the same proposition cannot at the same time be false and true) and the law of excluded middle (i.e. either a proposition is true or it is false) are both real propositions. They are, like the axioms of geometry, experimental truths, not truths known a priori. They represent generalizations or inductions from observation—very well-justified inductions, to be sure, but inductions nonetheless. This leads Mill to say that the necessity typically ascribed to the truths of mathematics and logic by his intuitionist opponents is an illusion, thereby undermining intuitionist argumentative fortifications at their strongest point.

A System of Logic thus represents the most thorough attempt to argue for empiricism in epistemology, logic, and mathematics before the twentieth century (for the best discussion of this point, see Skorupski 1989). Though revolutionary advances in logic and philosophy of language in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries have rendered many of Mill’s technical points about semantics and logic obsolete, the basic philosophical vision that Mill defends is very much a live option (see, for example, the work of Quine).

ii. Other Topics of Interest

There are some other topics covered in the System of Logic that are of interest. First is Mill’s treatment of deduction (in the form of the syllogism). His discussion is driven by one basic concern: Why wouldn’t a deduction simply tell us what we already know? How can it be informative? Mill discounts two common views about the syllogism, namely, that it is useless (because it tells us what we already know) and that it is the correct analysis of what the mind actually does when it discovers truths. To understand why Mill discounts these ways of thinking about deduction, we need to understand his views on inference.

The key point here is that all inference is from particular to particular. When we infer that the Duke of Wellington is mortal from “All men are mortal,” what we are really doing is inferring the Duke’s mortality from the mortality of the individual people with whose mortality we are familiar. What the mind does in making a deductive inference is not to move from a universal truth to a particular one. Rather, it moves from truths about a number of particulars to a smaller number (or one). The general statement that “All men are mortal” only allows us to more easily register what we know—it reflects neither the true inference being made nor the warrant or evidence we have for making the inference. Though general propositions are not necessary for reasoning, they are heuristically useful (as are the syllogisms that employ them). They aid us in memory and comprehension.

Mill’s famous treatment of induction reveals the a posteriori grounds for belief. He focuses on four different methods of experimental inquiry that attempt to single out from the circumstances that precede or follow a phenomenon the ones that are linked to the phenomenon by an invariable law. (System, III.viii.1). That is, we test to see if a purported causal connection exists by observing the relevant phenomena under an assortment of situations. If we wish, for example, to know whether a virus causes a disease, how can we prove it? What counts as good evidence for such a belief? The four methods of induction or experimental inquiry—the methods of agreement, of difference, of residues, and of concomitant variation—provide answers to these questions by showing what we need to demonstrate in order to claim that a causal law holds. Can we show, using the method of difference, that when the virus is not present the disease is also absent? If so, then we have some grounds for believing that the virus causes the disease.

Another issue addressed in A System of Logic that is of abiding interest is Mill’s handling of free will. Mill’s commitment to naturalism includes treating the human will as a potential object of scientific study: “Our will causes our bodily actions in the same sense, and in no other, in which cold causes ice, or a spark causes an explosion of gunpowder. The volition, a state of our mind, is the antecedent; the motion of our limbs in conformity to the volition, is the consequent.” (System, III.v.11). The questions that readily arise are how, under this view, can one take the will to be free and how can we preserve responsibility and feelings of choice?

In his Autobiography, Mill recounts his own youthful, melancholy acceptance of the doctrine of “Philosophical Necessity” (advocated by, among others, Robert Owen and his followers): “I felt as if I was scientifically proved to be the helpless slave of antecedent circumstances; as if my character and that of all others had been formed for us by agencies beyond our control, and was wholly out of our own power.” (CW, I.175-7). But it is precisely the idea that our character is formed for us, not by us, that Mill thinks is a “grand error.” (System, VI.ii.3). We have the power to alter our own character. Though our own character is formed by circumstances, among those circumstances are our own desires. We cannot directly will our characters to be one way rather than another, but we can will actions that shape those characters.

Mill addresses an obvious objection: what leads us to will to change our character? Isn’t that determined? Mill agrees. Our desire to change our character is determined largely by our experience of painful and pleasant consequences associated with our character. For Mill, however, the important point is that, even if we don’t control the desire to change our character, we are still left with the feeling of moral freedom, which is the feeling of being able to modify our own character “if we wish.” (System, VI.ii.3). What Mill wants to save in the doctrine of free will is simply the feeling that we have “real power over the formation of our own character.” (CW, I.177). If we have the desire to change our character, we find that we can. If we lack that desire it is “of no consequence what we think forms our character,” because we don’t care about altering it. For Mill, this is a thick enough notion of freedom to avoid fatalism.

One of the basic problems for this kind of naturalistic picture of human beings and wills is that it clashes with our first-person image of ourselves as reasoners and agents. As Kant understood, and as the later hermeneutic tradition emphasizes, we think of ourselves as autonomous followers of objectively given rules (Skorupski 1989, 279). It seems extremely difficult to provide a convincing naturalistic account of, for example, making a choice (without explaining away as illusory our first-person experience of making choices).

The desire to treat the will as an object, like ice or gunpowder, open to natural scientific study falls within Mill’s broader claim that the moral sciences, which include economics, history, and psychology among others, are fundamentally similar to the natural sciences. Though we may have difficulty running experiments in the human realm, that realm and its objects are, in principle, just as open to the causal explanations we find in physics or biology.

Perhaps the most interesting element of his analysis of the moral sciences is his commitment to what has been called “methodological individualism,” or the view that social and political phenomena are explicable by appeal to the behavior of individuals. In other words, social facts are reducible to facts about individuals: “The laws of the phenomena of society are, and can be, nothing but the laws of the actions and passions of human beings united together in the social state. Men, however, in a state of society, are still men; their actions and passions are obedient to the laws of individual human nature. Men are not, when brought together, converted into another kind of substance with different properties.” (System, VI.vii.1).

This position puts Mill in opposition to Auguste Comte, a founding figure in social theory (he coined the term “sociology”) and an important influence on, and correspondent with, Mill. Comte takes sociology rather than psychology to be the most basic of human sciences and takes individuals and their conduct to be best understood through the lens of social analysis. To put it simplistically, for Comte, the individual is an abstraction from the whole—its beliefs and conduct are determined by history and society. We understand the individual best, on this view, when we see the individual as an expression of its social institutions and setting. This naturally leads to a kind of historicism. Though Mill recognized the important influences of social institutions and history on individuals, for him society is nevertheless only able to shape individuals through affecting their experiences—experiences structured by universal principles of human psychology that operate in all times and places. (See Mandelbaum 1971, 167ff).

b. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy

Mill’s attacks on intuitionism continued throughout his life. One notable example is his 1865 An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, which revisits much of the same ground as A System of Logic in the guise of a thorough-going criticism of Hamilton, a thinker influenced by Reid and Kant whom Mill took as representing “the great fortress of the intuitional philosophy in this country.” (CW, I.270). The rather hefty volume explores “some of the disputed questions in the domain of psychology and metaphysics.” (CW, I.271).

Among the doctrines given most attention is that of the “relativity of knowledge,” something to which Mill takes Hamilton as insufficiently committed. It is the idea that we have no access to “things-in-themselves” (thus, the relativity versus absoluteness of knowledge) and that we are limited to analyzing the phenomena of consciousness. Mill, who accepts this basic principle, counts himself as a Berkeleian phenomenalist and famously defines matter in the Examination as “a Permanent Possibility of Sensation,” (CW, IX.183), thinks that Hamilton accepts this doctrine in a confused manner. “He affirms without reservation, that certain attributes (extension, figures, etc.) are known to us as they really exist out of ourselves; and also that all our knowledge of them is relative to us. And these two assertions are only reconcileable, if relativity to us is understood in the altogether trivial sense, that we know them only so far as our faculties permit.” (CW, IX.22). Hamilton therefore seems to want to have his cake and eat it too when it comes to knowledge of the external world. On the one hand, he wants to declare that we have access to things as they are, thereby aligning himself with Reid’s project of avoiding the fall into (Humean) skepticism—a fall prompted by the Lockean “way of ideas.” On the other hand, he wants to follow Kant in limiting our knowledge of things-in-themselves, thereby reigning in the pretensions of metaphysical speculation. Mill avoids this dilemma by rejecting Hamilton’s position that we know things outside as they really are.

One point of historical interest about the Examination is the impact that it had on the way that the history of philosophy is taught. Mill’s demolition of Hamilton’s reputation led to the removal of Reid and the school of Scottish “common sense” philosophy from the curriculum in Britain and America. As Kuklick puts it, the success of Mill’s Examination “is the crucial event in understanding the development of the contemporary view of Modern Philosophy in America.” By destroying “the credibility of the entire Scottish reply to Hume,” Mill’s Examination led Anglo-American philosophers to turn to Kant in the later part of the nineteenth century in order to find more satisfactory response to Humean skepticism (Kuklick 1984, 128). Thus, the standard course in Modern Philosophy that includes all or some of Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, and Kant, is partly an unintended consequence of the publication of Mill’s attack on Hamilton and on intuitionism more broadly.

c. Psychological Writings

As noted in the discussion of A System of Logic, Mill’s commitment to “methodological individualism” makes psychology the foundational moral science. Though he never wrote a work of his own on psychology, he edited and contributed notes to an 1869 re-issue of his father’s 1829 work in psychology, Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind, and reviewed the work of his friend and correspondent, Alexander Bain. All three were proponents of the associationist school of psychology, whose roots go back to Hobbes and especially Locke and whose members included Gay, Hartley, and Priestly in the eighteenth century and the Mills, Bain, and Herbert Spencer in the nineteenth century.

Mill distinguishes between the a posteriori and a priori schools of psychology. The former “resolves the whole contents of the mind into experience.” (CW, XI.341). The latter emphasizes that “in every act of thought, down to the most elementary, there is an ingredient which is not given to the mind, but contributed by the mind in virtue of its inherent powers.” (CW, XI.344). In the a priori or intuitionist school, experience “instead of being the source and prototype of our ideas, is itself a product of the mind’s own forces working on the impressions we receive from without, and has always a mental as well as an external element.” (CW, XI.344).

The associationist version of a posteriori psychology has two basic doctrines: “first, that the more recondite phenomena of the mind are formed out of the more simple and elementary; and, secondly, that the mental law, by means of which this formation takes place, is the Law of Association.” (CW, XI.345). The associationist psychologists, then, would attempt to explain mental phenomena by showing them to be the ultimate product of simpler components of experience (e.g. color, sound, smell, pleasure, pain) connected to each other through associations. These associations take two basic forms: resemblance and contiguity in space and/or time. Thus, these psychologists attempt to explain our idea of an orange or our feelings of greed as the product of simpler ideas connected by association.

Part of the impulse for this account of psychology is its apparent scientific character and beauty. Associationism attempts to explain a large variety of mental phenomena on the basis of experience plus very few mental laws of association. It therefore appeals to those who are particularly drawn to simplicity in their scientific theories.

Another attraction of associationist psychology, however, is its implications for views on moral education and social reform. If the contents of our minds, including beliefs and moral feelings, are products of experiences that we undergo connected according to very simple laws, then this raises the possibility that human beings are capable of being radically re-shaped—that our natures, rather than being fixed, are open to major alteration. In other words, if our minds are cobbled together by laws of association working on the materials of experience, then this suggests that if our experiences were to change, so would our minds. This doctrine tends to place much greater emphasis on social and political institutions like the family, the workplace, and the state, than does the doctrine that the nature of the mind offers strong resistance to being shaped by experience (i.e. that the mind molds experience rather than being molded by it). Associationism thereby fits nicely into an agenda of reform, because it suggests that many of the problems of individuals are explained by their situations (and the associations that these situations promote) rather than by some intrinsic feature of the mind. As Mill puts it in the Autobiography in discussing the conflict between the intuitionist and a posteriori schools:

The practical reformer has continually to demand that changes be made in things which are supported by powerful and widely spread feelings, or to question the apparent necessity and indefeasibleness of established facts; and it is often an indispensable part of his argument to shew, how these powerful feelings had their origin, and how those facts came to seem necessary and indefeasible. There is therefore a natural hostility between him and a philosophy which discourages the explanation of feelings and moral facts by circumstances and association, and prefers to treat them as ultimate elements of human nature…I have long felt that the prevailing tendency to regard all the marked distinctions of human character as innate, and in the main indelible, and to ignore the irresistible proofs that by far the greater part of those differences, whether between individuals, races, or sexes, are such as not only might but naturally would be produced by differences in circumstances, is one of the chief hindrances to the rational treatment of great social questions, and one of the greatest stumbling blocks to human improvement. (CW, I.269-70).

d. Utilitarianism

Another maneuver in his battle with intuitionism came when Mill published Utilitarianism (1861) in installments in Fraser’s Magazine (it was later brought out in book form in 1863). It offers a candidate for a first principle of morality, a principle that provides us with a criterion distinguishing right and wrong. The utilitarian candidate is the principle of utility, which holds that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain and the privation of pleasure.” (CW, X.210).

i. History of the Principle of Utility

By Mill’s time, the principle of utility possessed a long history stretching back to the 1730’s (with roots going further back to Hobbes, Locke, and even to Epicurus). In the eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries, it had been explicitly invoked by three British intellectual factions. Though all may have agreed that an action’s consequences for the general happiness were to dictate its rightness or wrongness, the reasons behind the acceptance of that principle and the uses to which the principle was put varied greatly.

The earliest supporters of the principle of utility were the religious utilitarians represented by, among others, John Gay, John Brown, Soame Jenyns, and, most famously, William Paley, whose 1785 The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy was one of the most frequently re-printed and well read books of moral thought of the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries (to Mill’s dismay, Bentham’s utilitarianism was often conflated with Paley’s). Religious utilitarianism was very popular among the educated classes and dominated in the universities until the 1830’s. These thinkers were all deeply influenced by Locke’s empiricism and psychological hedonism and often stood opposed to the competing moral doctrines of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, Clarke, and Wollaston.

The religious utilitarians looked to the Christian God to address a basic problem, namely how to harmonize the interests of individuals, who are motivated by their own happiness, with the interests of the society as a whole. Once we understand that what we must do is what God wills (because of God’s power of eternal sanction) and that God wills the happiness of his creatures, morality and our own self-interest will be seen to overlap. God guarantees that an individual’s self-interest lies in virtue, in furthering the happiness of others. Without God and his sanctions of eternal punishment and reward, it would be hard to find motives that “are likely to be found sufficient to withhold men from the gratification of lust, revenge, envy, ambition, avarice.” (Paley 2002 [1785], 39). As we shall see in a moment, another possible motivation for caring about the general happiness—this one non-religious—is canvassed by Mill in Chapter Three of Utilitarianism.

In contrast to religious utilitarianism, which had few aspirations to be a moral theory that revises ordinary moral attitudes, the two late-eighteenth century secular versions of utilitarianism grew out of various movements for reform. The principle of utility—and the correlated commitments to happiness as the only intrinsically desirable end and to the moral equivalency of the happiness of different individuals—was itself taken to be an instrument of reform.

One version of secular utilitarianism was represented by William Godwin (husband of Mary Wollstonecraft and father of Mary Shelley), who achieved great notoriety with the publication of his Political Justice of 1793. Though his fame (or infamy) was relatively short-lived, Godwin’s use of the principle of utility for the cause of radical political and social critique began the identification of utilitarianism with anti-religiosity and with dangerous democratic values.

The second version of secular utilitarianism, and the one that inspired Mill, arose from the work of Jeremy Bentham. Bentham, who was much more successful than Godwin at building a movement around his ideas, employed the principle of utility as a device of political, social, and legal criticism. It is important to note, however, that Bentham’s interest in the principle of utility did not arise from concern about ethical theory as much as from concern about legislative and legal reform.

This history enables us to understand Mill’s invocation of the principle of utility in its polemical context—Mill’s support of that principle should not be taken as mere intellectual exercise. In the realm of politics, the principle of utility served to bludgeon opponents of reform. First and foremost, reform meant extension of the vote. But it also meant legal reform, including overhaul of the common law system and of legal institutions, and varieties of social reform, especially of institutions that tended to favor aristocratic and moneyed interests. Though Bentham and Godwin intended it to have this function in the late eighteenth century, utilitarianism became influential only when tied with the political machinery of the Radical party, which had particular prominence on the English scene in the 1830’s.

In the realm of ethical debate, Mill took his opponents to be the “intuitionists” led by Sedgwick and Whewell, both Cambridge men. They were the contemporary representatives of an ethical tradition that understood its history as tied to Butler, Reid, Coleridge, and turn of the century German thought (especially that of Kant). Though intuitionists and members of Mill’s a posteriori or “inductive” school recognize “to a great extent, the same moral laws,” they differ “as to their evidence and the source from which they derive their authority. According to the one opinion, the principles of morals are evident a priori, requiring nothing to command assent except that the meaning of the terms be understood. According to the other doctrine, right and wrong, as well as truth and falsehood, are questions of observation and experience.” (CW, X.206).

The chief danger represented by the proponents of intuitionism was not from the ethical content of their theories per se, which defended honesty, justice, benevolence, etc., but from the kinds of justifications offered for their precepts and the support such a view lent to the social and political status quo. As we saw in the discussion of the System of Logic and with reference to Mill’s statements in his Autobiography, he takes intuitionism to be dangerous because it allegedly enables people to ratify their own prejudices as moral principles—in intuitionism, there is no “external standard” by which to adjudicate differing moral claims (for example, Mill understood Kant’s categorical imperative as getting any moral force it possesses either from considerations of utility or from mere prejudice hidden by hand-waving). The principle of utility, alternatively, evaluates moral claims by appealing to the external standard of pain and pleasure. It presented each individual for moral consideration as someone capable of suffering and enjoyment.

ii. Basic Argument

Mill’s defense of the principle of utility in Utilitarianism includes five chapters. In the first, Mill sets out the problem, distinguishes between the intuitionist and “inductive” schools of morality, and also suggests limits to what we can expect from proofs of first principles of morality. He argues that “(q)uestions of ultimate ends are not amenable to direct proof.” (CW, X.207). All that can be done is to present considerations “capable of determining the intellect either to give or withhold its assent to the doctrine; and this is equivalent to proof.” (CW, X.208). Ultimately, he will want to prove in Chapter Four the basis for the principle of utility—that happiness is the only intrinsically desirable thing—by showing that we spontaneously accept it on reflection. (Skorupski 1989, 8). It is rather easy to show that happiness is something we desire intrinsically, not for the sake of other things. What is hard is to show that it is the only thing we intrinsically desire or value. Mill agrees that we do not always value things like virtue as means or instruments to happiness. We do sometimes seem to value such things for their own sakes. Mill contends, however, that on reflection we will see that when we appear to value them for their own sakes we are actually valuing them as parts of happiness (rather than as intrinsically desirable on their own or as means to happiness). That is, we value virtue, freedom, etc. as things that make us happy by their mere possession. This is all the proof we can give that happiness is our only ultimate end; it must rely on introspection and on careful and honest examination of our feelings and motives.

In Chapter Two, Mill corrects misconceptions about the principle of utility. One misconception is that utilitarianism, by endorsing the Epicurean view “that life has…no higher end than pleasure” is a “doctrine worthy only of swine.” (CW, X.210). Mill counters that “the accusation supposes human beings to be capable of no pleasures except those of which swine are capable.” (CW, X.210). He proffers a distinction (one not found in Bentham) between higher and lower pleasures, with higher pleasures including mental, aesthetic, and moral pleasures. When we are evaluating whether or not an action is good by evaluating the happiness that we can expect to be produced by it, he argues that higher pleasures should be taken to be in kind (rather than by degree) preferable to lower pleasures. This has led scholars to wonder whether Mill’s utilitarianism differs significantly from Bentham’s and whether Mill’s distinction between higher and lower pleasures creates problems for our ability to know what will maximize aggregate happiness.

A second objection to the principle of utility is that “it is exacting too much to require that people shall always act from the inducement of promoting the general interest of society.” (CW, X.219). Mill replies that this is to “confound the rule of action with the motive of it.” (CW, X.219). Ethics is supposed to tell us what our duties are, “but no system of ethics requires that the sole motive of all we do shall be a feeling of duty; on the contrary, ninety-nine hundredths of all our actions are done from other motives, and rightly so done if the rule of duty does not condemn them.” (CW, X.219). To do the right thing, in other words, we do not need to be constantly motivated by concern for the general happiness. The large majority of actions intend the good of individuals (including ourselves) rather than the good of the world. Yet the world’s good is made up of the good of the individuals that constitute it and unless we are in the position of, say, a legislator, we act properly by looking to private rather than to public good. Our attention to the public well-being usually needs to extend only so far as is required to know that we aren’t violating the rights of others.

Chapter Three addresses the topic of motivation again by focusing on the following question: What is the source of our obligation to the principle of utility? What, in other words, motivates us to act in ways approved of by the principle of utility? With any moral theory, one must remember that ‘ought implies can,’ i.e. that if moral demands are to be legitimate, we must be the kind of beings that can meet those demands. Mill defends the possibility of a strong utilitarian conscience (i.e. a strong feeling of obligation to the general happiness) by showing how such a feeling can develop out of the natural desire we have to be in unity with fellow creatures—a desire that enables us to care what happens to them and to perceive our own interests as linked with theirs. Though Chapter Two showed that we do not need to attend constantly to the general happiness, it is nevertheless a sign of moral progress when the happiness of others, including the happiness of those we don’t know, becomes important to us.

Finally, Chapter Five shows how utilitarianism accounts for justice. In particular, Mill shows how utilitarianism can explain the special status we seem to grant to justice and to the violations of it. Justice is something we are especially keen to defend. Mill begins by marking off morality (the realm of duties) from expediency and worthiness by arguing that duties are those things we think people ought to be punished for not fulfilling. He then suggests that justice is demarcated from other areas of morality, because it includes those duties to which others have correlative rights, “Justice implies something which it is not only right to do, and wrong not to do, but which some individual person can claim from us as his moral right.” (CW, X.247). Though no one has a right to my charity, even if I have a duty to be charitable, others have rights not to have me injure them or to have me repay what I have promised.

Critics of utilitarianism have placed special emphasis on its inability to provide a satisfactory account of rights. For Mill, to have a right is “to have something which society ought to defend me in the possession of. If the objector goes on to ask why it ought, I can give no other reason than general utility.” (CW, X.250). But what if the general utility demands that we violate your rights? The intuition that something is wrong if your rights can be violated for the sake of the general good provoked the great challenge to utilitarian conceptions of justice, leveled with special force by twentieth century thinkers like John Rawls.

e. On Liberty

The topic of justice received further treatment at Mill’s hands in his famous 1859 book On Liberty. This work is the one, along with A System of Logic, that Mill thought would have the most longevity. It concerns civil and social liberty or, to look at it from the contrary point of view, the nature and limits of the power that can legitimately be exercised by society over the individual.

Mill begins by retelling the history of struggle between rulers and ruled and suggests that social rather than political tyranny is the greater danger for modern, commercial nations like Britain. This social “tyranny of the majority” (a phrase Mill takes from Tocqueville) arises from the enforcement of rules of conduct that are both arbitrary and strongly adhered to. The practical principle that guides the majority “to their opinions on the regulation of human conduct, is the feeling in each person’s mind that everybody should be required to act as he, and those with whom he sympathizes, would like them to act.” (On Liberty [OL], 48). Such a feeling is particularly dangerous because it is taken to be self-justifying and self-evident.

There is a need, therefore, for a rationally grounded principle which governs a society’s dealings with individuals. This “one very simple principle”—often called the “harm principle”—entails that:

[T]he sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number, is self-protection. That the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. He cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him to do so, because it will make him happier, because, in the opinion of others, to do so would be wise, or even right. These are good reasons for remonstrating with him, or reasoning with him, or persuading him, or entreating him, but not for compelling him, or visiting him with any evil in case he do otherwise. (OL, 51-2)

This anti-paternalistic principle identifies three basic regions of human liberty: the “inward domain of consciousness,” liberty of tastes and pursuits (i.e. of framing our own life plan), and the freedom to unite with others.

Mill, unlike other liberal theorists, makes no appeal to “abstract right” in order to justify the harm principle. The reason for accepting the freedom of individuals to act as they choose, so long as they cause minimal or no harm to others, is that it would promote “utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being.” (OL, 53). In other words, abiding by the harm principle is desirable because it promotes what Mill calls the “free development of individuality” or the development of our humanity.

Behind this rests the idea that humanity is capable of progress—that latent or underdeveloped abilities and virtues can be actualized under the right conditions. Human nature is not static. It is not merely re-expressed in generations and individuals. It is “not a machine to be built after a model, and set to do exactly the work prescribed for it, but a tree, which requires to grow and develop itself on all sides, according to the tendency of the inward forces which make it a living thing.” (OL, 105). Though human nature can be thought of as something living, it is also, like an English garden, something amenable to improvement through effort. “Among the works of man, which human life is rightly employed in perfecting and beautifying, the first in importance surely is man himself.” (OL, 105). The two conditions that promote development of our humanity are freedom and variety of situation, both of which the harm principle encourages.

A basic philosophical problem presented by the work is what counts as “harm to others.” Where should we mark the boundary between conduct that is principally self-regarding versus conduct that involves others? Does drug-use cause harm to others sufficient to be prevented? Does prostitution? Pornography? Should polygamy be allowed? How about public nudity? Though these are difficult questions, Mill provides the reader with a principled way of deliberating about them.

f. The Subjection of Women and Other Social and Political Writings

Many volumes of Mill’s writings deal with topics of social and political concern. These include writings on specific political problems in India, America, Ireland, France, and England, on the nature of democracy (Considerations on Representative Government) and civilization, on slavery, on law and jurisprudence, on the workplace, and on the family and the status of women. The last subject was the topic of Mill’s well-known The Subjection of Women, an important work in the history of feminism.

The radical nature of Mill’s call for women’s equality is often lost to us after over a century of protest and changing social attitudes. Yet the subordination of women to men when Mill was writing remains striking. Among other indicators of this subordination are the following: (1) British women had fewer grounds for divorce than men until 1923; (2) Husbands controlled their wives personal property (with the occasional exception of land) until the Married Women’s Property Acts of 1870 and 1882; (3) Children were the husband’s; (4) Rape was impossible within a marriage; and (5) Wives lacked crucial features of legal personhood, since the husband was taken as the representative of the family (thereby eliminating the need for women’s suffrage). This gives some indication of how disturbing and/or ridiculous the idea of a marriage between equals could appear to Victorians.

The object of the essay was to show “(t)hat the principle which regulates the existing social relations between the two sexes—the legal subordination of one sex to the other—is wrong in itself, and now one of the chief hindrances to human improvement; and that it ought to be replaced by a principle of perfect equality, admitting no power or privilege on the one side, nor disability on the other.” (CW, XXI.261). This shows how Mill appeals to both the patent injustice of contemporary familial arrangements and to the negative moral impact of those arrangements on the people within them. In particular, he discusses the ways in which the subordination of women negatively affects not only the women, but also the men and children in the family. This subordination stunts the moral and intellectual development of women by restricting their field of activities, pushing them either into self-sacrifice or into selfishness and pettiness. Men, alternatively, either become brutal through their relationships with women or turn away from projects of self-improvement to pursue the social “consideration” that women desire.

It is important to note that Mill’s concern for the status of women dovetails with the rest of his thought—it is not a disconnected issue. For example, his support for women’s equality was buttressed by associationism, which claims that minds are created by associative laws operating on experience. This implies that if we change the experiences and upbringing of women, then their minds will change. This enabled Mill to argue against those who tried to suggest that the subordination of women to men reflected a natural order that women were by nature incapable of equality with men. If many women were incapable of true friendship with noble men, says Mill, that is not a result of their natures, but of their faulty environments.

g. Principles of Political Economy

Another work that addresses issues of social and political concern is Mill’s Principles of Political Economy of 1848. The book went through numerous editions and served as the dominant British textbook in economics until being displaced by Alfred Marshall’s 1890 Principles of Economics. Mill intended the work as both a survey of contemporary economic thought (highlighting the theories of David Ricardo, but also including some contributions of his own on topics like international trade) and as an exploration of applications of economic ideas to social concerns. It was “not a book merely of abstract science, but also of application, and treated Political Economy not as a thing by itself, but as a fragment of a greater whole.” (CW, I.243). These two interests nicely divide the text into the first three more technical books on production, distribution, and exchange and the last two books, which address the influences of societal progress and of government on economic activity (and vice versa). The technical work is largely obsolete. Mill’s relating of economics and society, however, remains of great interest.

In particular, Mill shared concerns with others (e.g. Carlyle, Coleridge, Southey, etc.) about the moral impact of industrialization. Though many welcomed the material wealth produced by industrialization, there was a sense that those very cornerstones of British economic growth—the division of labor (including the increasing simplicity and repetitiveness of the work) and the growing size of factories and businesses—led to a spiritual and moral deadening.

Coleridge expressed this in his contrast of mere “civilization” with “cultivation”:

The permanency of the nation…and its progressiveness and personal freedom…depend on a continuing and progressive civilization. But civilization is itself but a mixed good, if not far more a corrupting influence, the hectic of disease, not the bloom of health, and a nation so distinguished more fitly to be called a varnished than a polished people, where this civilization is not grounded in cultivation, in the harmonious development of those qualities and faculties that characterize our humanity. We must be men in order to be citizens. (Coleridge 1839, 46).

“Civilization” expresses central features of modernization, including industrialism, cosmopolitanism, and increasing material wealth. But, for Coleridge, civilization needed to be subordinated to cultivation of our humanity (expressed in terms similar to those later found in On Liberty).

This concern for the moral impact of economic growth explains, among other things, his commitment to a brand of socialism. In an essay on the French historian Michelet, Mill praises the monastic associations of Italy and France after the reforms of St. Benedict: “Unlike the useless communities of contemplative ascetics in the East, they were diligent in tilling the earth and fabricating useful products; they knew and taught that temporal work may also be a spiritual exercise.” (CW, XX.240). It was the desire to transform temporal work into a spiritual and moral exercise that led Mill to favor socialist changes in the workplace.

In order to transform the workplace from a setting filled with antagonism into a “school of sympathy” that would enable workers to feel a part of something greater than themselves—thereby mitigating the rampant selfishness encouraged by industrial society—Mill recommends “industrial co-operatives.” Mill thought that these co-operatives had the advantage over communes or other socialist institutions because they were able to compete against traditional firms (his complaint against many other socialists is that they undervalued competition as a morally useful stimulus to activity). These co-operatives can take two forms: a profit-sharing system in which worker pay is tied to the success of the business or a worker co-operative in which workers share ownership of capital. The latter was preferable because it turned all the workers into entrepreneurs, calling upon many of the faculties that mere labor for pay left to atrophy.

Though Mill contended that laborers were generally unfit for socialism given their current level of education and development, he thought that modern industrial societies should take small steps towards fostering co-operatives. Included among these steps was the institution of limited partnerships. Up to Mill’s time, partners shared full liability for losses, including any personal property they owned—obviously a strong deterrent to the founding of worker co-operatives.

Mill’s recommendations for the economic organization of society, like his political and social policies, always paid careful attention to how institutions, laws, and practices impacted the intellectual, moral, and affective well-being of the individuals operating under or within them.

h. Essays on Religion

Mill’s criticism of traditional religious doctrines and institutions and his promotion of the “Religion of Humanity,” also depended largely on concerns about human cultivation and education. Though the Benthamite “philosophic radicals,” including Mill, took Christianity to be a particularly pernicious superstition that fostered indifference or hostility to human happiness (the keystone of utilitarian morality), Mill also thought that religion could potentially serve important ethical needs by supplying us with “ideal conceptions grander and more beautiful than we see realized in the prose of human life.” (CW, X.419). In so doing, religion elevates our feelings, cultivates sympathy with others, and imbues even our smallest activities with a sense of purpose.

The posthumously published three Essays on Religion (1874)—on “Nature,” the “Utility of Religion,” and “Theism”—criticized traditional religious views and formulated an alternative in the guise of the Religion of Humanity. Along with the criticism of religion’s moral effects that he shared with the Benthamites, Mill was also critical of the intellectual laziness that permitted belief in an omnipotent and benevolent God. He felt, following his father, that the world as we find it could not possibly have come from such a God given the evils rampant in it; either his power is limited or he is not wholly benevolent.

Beyond attacking arguments concerning the essence of God, Mill undermines a variety of arguments for his existence including all a priori arguments. He concludes that the only legitimate proof of God is an a posteriori and probabilistic argument from the design of the universe – the traditional argument (stemming from Aristotle) that complex features of the world, like the eye, are unlikely to have arisen by chance, hence there must be a designer. (Mill acknowledges the possibility that Darwin, in his 1859 The Origin of Species, has provided a wholly naturalistic explanation of such features, but he suggests that it is too early to judge of Darwin’s success).

Inspired by Comte, Mill finds an alternative to traditional religion in the Religion of Humanity, in which an idealized humanity becomes an object of reverence and the morally useful features of traditional religion are supposedly purified and accentuated. Humanity becomes an inspiration by being placed imaginatively within the drama of human history, which has a destination or point, namely the victory of good over evil. As Mill puts it, history should be seen as “the unfolding of a great epic or dramatic action,” which terminates “in the happiness or misery, the elevation or degradation, of the human race.” It is “an unremitting conflict between good and evil powers, of which every act done by any of us, insignificant as we are, forms one of the incidents.” (CW, XXI.244). As we begin to see ourselves as participants in this Manichean drama, as fighting alongside people like Socrates, Newton, and Jesus to secure the ultimate victory of good over evil, we become capable of greater sympathy, moral feeling, and an ennobled sense of the meaning of our own lives. The Religion of Humanity thereby acts as an instrument of human cultivation.

3. Conclusion

Mill’s intellect engaged with the world rather than fled from it. His was not an ivory tower philosophy, even when dealing with the most abstract of philosophical topics. His work is of enduring interest because it reflects how a fine mind struggled with and attempted to synthesize important intellectual and cultural movements. He stands at the intersections of conflicts between enlightenment and romanticism, liberalism and conservatism, and historicism and rationalism. In each case, as someone interested in conversation rather than pronouncement, he makes sincere efforts to move beyond polemic into sustained and thoughtful analysis. That analysis produced challenging answers to problems that still remain. Whether or not one agrees with his answers, Mill serves as a model for thinking about human problems in a serious and civilized way.

4. References and Further Reading

* = works of note.

Primary Texts

  • Bentham, Jeremy. Deontology together with A Table of the Springs of Action and The Article on Utilitarianism. Edited by Amnon Goldworth. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1983.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. The Works of Jeremy Bentham. Edited by John Bowring. 10 vols. New York: Russell and Russell, 1962.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. A Carlyle Reader. Edited by G.B. Tennyson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. Critical and Miscellaneous Essays. Philadelphia: Casey and Hart, 1845.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. Past and Present. London: Ward, Lock, and Bowden, Ltd., 1897.
  • Coleridge, S.T.C. On the Constitution of the Church and State According to the Idea of Each (3rd Edition), and Lay Sermons (2nd Edition). London: William Pickering, 1839.
  • Comte, Auguste. A General View of Positivism. 1848. Reprint. Dubuque, Iowa: Brown Reprints, 1971.
  • Mill, James. An Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind. Edited and with Notes by John Stuart Mill. London: Longmans, Green and Dyer, 1869.
  • *Mill, John Stuart. The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill. Gen. Ed. John M. Robson. 33 vols. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1963-91.
    • The standard scholarly editions including Mill’s published works, letters, and notes; an outstanding resource.
  • Mill, John Stuart. A System of Logic. New York: Harper & Brothers, 1874.
  • Mill, John Stuart. On Liberty. Peterborough, Canada: Broadview Press, 1999.
  • Paley, William. The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 2002 [1785].

Secondary Texts

  • Britton, Karl. ‘John Stuart Mill on Christianity.’ In James and John Stuart Mill: Papers of the Centenary Conference, John Robson and Michael Laine (eds.). Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1976.
  • *Capaldi, Nicholas. John Stuart Mill: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
    • A recent and very thorough treatment of Mill’s life and work.
  • Carlisle, Janice. John Stuart Mill and the Writing of Character. Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1991.
  • Collini, Stefan. ‘The Idea of “Character” in Victorian Political Thought.’ Transactions of the Royal Historical Society, 5th series, 35 (1985), 29-50.
  • *Collini, Stefan. Public Moralists, Political Thought and Intellectual Life in Great Britain 1850-1930. Oxford: Clarendon, 1991.
    • A useful history that includes discussion of Mill’s intellectual and institutional context.
  • *Collini, Stefan, Donald Winch, and John Burrow. That Noble Science of Politics: A Study in Nineteenth-century Intellectual History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
    • Very valuable work on nineteenth century British political discourse; includes discussion of the Philosophic Radicals.
  • Donner, Wendy. The Liberal Self: John Stuart Mill’s Moral and Political Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell Univ. Press, 1991.
  • Harrison, Brian. ‘State Intervention and Moral Reform in nineteeth-century England.’ In Pressure from Without in Early Victorian England, edited by Patricia Hollis, 289-322. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1974.
  • *Halevy, Elie. The Growth of Philosophical Radicalism. Translated by Mary Morris. Boston: The Beacon Press, 1955.
    • Though originally published in 1904, this is still a seminal work in the history of utilitarianism.
  • Hamburger, Joseph. ‘Religion and “On Liberty.”’ In A Cultivated Mind: Essays on J.S. Mill Presented to John M. Robson, edited by Michael Laine, 139-81. Toronto: Univ. of Toronto Press, 1961.
  • Harrison, Ross. Bentham. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1983.
  • Hedley, Douglas. Coleridge, Philosophy and Religion: Aids to Reflection and the Mirror of the Spirit. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Heydt, Colin. ‘Narrative, Imagination, and the Religion of Humanity in Mill’s Ethics.’ Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 44, no. I (Jan. 2006), 99-115.
  • Heydt, Colin. ‘Mill, Bentham, and “Internal Culture”.’ British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 14, no. 2 (May 2006), 275-302.
  • Heydt, Colin. Rethinking Mill’s Ethics: Character and Aesthetic Education. London: Continuum Press, 2006.
  • *Hollander, Samuel. The Economics of John Stuart Mill (Toronto: UTP and Oxford: Blackwell), 1985: Volume I, Theory and Method. Volume II, Political Economy, 482-1030.
    • The seminal work on Mill’s economics.
  • Jenkyns, Richard. The Victorians and Ancient Greece. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1980.
  • Jones, H. S. ‘John Stuart Mill as Moralist.’ Journal of the History of Ideas 53 (1992): 287-308.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. ‘Seven thinkers and how they grew: Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz; Locke, Berkeley, Hume; Kant.’ In Philosophy in History, Rorty, Schneewind, Skinner (eds.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • *Mandelbaum, M. History, Man and Reason. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins Univ. Press, 1971.
    • An excellent intellectual history of Europe in the nineteenth century; contains very valuable discussions of Mill.
  • Matz, Lou. ‘The Utility of Religious Illusion: A Critique of J.S. Mill’s Religion of Humanity.’ Utilitas 12 (2000): 137-154.
  • Millar, Alan. ‘Mill on Religion.’ In The Cambridge Companion to Mill, John Skorupski (ed.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • *Packe, Michael. The Life of John Stuart Mill. New York: MacMillan Company, 1954.
    • Prior to Capaldi’s, the standard life; still contains useful biographical detail.
  • Raeder, Linda C. John Stuart Mill and the Religion of Humanity. Columbia: University of Missouri Press, 2002.
  • Robson, John M. The Improvement of Mankind: The Social and Political Thought of John Stuart Mill. Toronto: Toronto Univ. Press, 1968.
  • Robson, John. ‘J.S. Mill’s Theory of Poetry.’ In Mill: A Collection of Critical Essays, J. B. Schneewind, (ed.). London: MacMillan, 1968.
  • Ryan, Alan. The Philosophy of John Stuart Mill. London: MacMillan, 1970.
  • *Ryan, Alan. J.S. Mill. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1974.
    • A nice introduction to Mill’s writings and central arguments.
  • *Schneewind, J. B. Sidgwick’s Ethics and Victorian Moral Philosophy. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977.
    • Still easily the best extant treatment of Victorian moral philosophy; includes extremely valuable examination of the conflict between utilitarianism and intuitionism.
  • Sen, Amartya, and Bernard Williams, eds. Utilitarianism and Beyond. Cambridge: Cambridge Univ. Press, 1982.
  • Shanely, Mary Lyndon. ‘Marital Slavery and Friendship: John Stuart Mill’s The Subjection of Women.’ Political Theory, Vol. 9, No. 2 (May 1981), 229-247.
  • Shanley, Mary Lyndon. ‘Suffrage, Protective Labor Legislation, and Married Women’s Property Laws in England.’ Signs, Vol. 12, No. 1 (1986).
  • *Skorupski, John. John Stuart Mill. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • Unquestionably, the best single book on Mill’s general philosophy.
  • Skorupski, John. ‘Introduction.’ In The Cambridge Companion to Mill, edited by John Skorupski. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • *Skorupski, John (editor). The Cambridge Companion to Mill. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • Includes a number of important articles and an extensive (though by now a little dated) bibliography.
  • Smart, J.J.C. ‘Extreme and Restricted Utilitarianism.’ The Philosophical Quarterly, (October 1956), 344-354.
  • *Thomas, William. The Philosophic Radicals: Nine Studies in Theory and Practice 1817-1841. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1979.
    • Very good resource for Philosophic Radicalism.
  • Turner, Michael J. “Radical Opinion in an Age of Reform: Thomas Perronet Thompson and the Westminster Review,” History, Vol. 86 (2001), Issue 281, 18-40.
  • Williams, Raymond. Culture and Society 1780-1950. New York: Columbia University Press, 1983.
  • *Wilson, Fred. Psychological Analysis and the Philosophy of John Stuart Mill. Toronto: Toronto Univ. Press, 1990.
    • Most thorough treatment of Mill’s psychological views.

Author Information

Colin Heydt
University of South Florida
U. S. A.

Caird, Edward

Edward Caird (1835—1908)

cairdA Scottish philosopher of the latter half of the nineteenth century, Edward Caird was one of the key figures of the idealist movement that dominated British philosophy from 1870 until the mid 1920s. Best known for his studies of Kant and Hegel, he argued that "Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism." Caird exercised a strong influence on the second generation of idealists, such as John Watson and Bernard Bosanquet. During his long and productive life, Caird was active in university and local politics and in educational and social reform. In his two series of Gifford lectures, he developed an important evolutionary account of religious conceptions ( the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity).

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critique of Kant and Hegel
  3. Philosophical Style
  4. Evolution and Religion
  5. Reference and Further Reading

1. Biography

Edward Caird was born in Greenock, Scotland, on March 23, 1835. A younger brother of the theologian John Caird (1820-1898), Edward began his studies at the University of Glasgow (which he briefly abandoned due to ill health), later moving to Balliol College, Oxford, from which he graduated in 1863. Following his graduation, he became Tutor at Merton College, Oxford (1864-1866), but soon left for the Professorship of Moral Philosophy at Glasgow (1866-1893). There, in addition to carrying out his academic duties, Caird was active in university and local politics, and was responsible for establishing the study of political sciences at the University. Following the death of Benjamin Jowett (1817-1893), Caird returned to Oxford, where he served as Master of Balliol College until 1907. He was a founding fellow of the British Academy (1902), a corresponding member of the French Academy, and held honorary doctorates from the Universities of St Andrews (1883), Oxford (1891), Cambridge (1898) and Wales (1902).

Like many of the British idealists, Caird had a strong interest in classical literature. In his two volumes of Essays on Literature and Philosophy (1892), he brought together critical essays on Goethe, Rousseau, Carlyle, Dante and Wordsworth, with a discussion (in Volume II) of Cartesianism (Descartes, Malbranche and Spinoza) and metaphysics.

Caird's politics were generally liberal and progressive. He supported the education of women, opposed the Anglo-Boer War (1899-1902) and, like Green, was involved in the 'university settlement' programs--particularly in Glasgow and in London--where recent university graduates and professionals attempted to narrow the gap between social classes by living and working among and with the poor.

In 1907, Caird resigned his position as Master of Balliol, and died the following year on November 1. He is buried in St Sepulchre's Cemetery, Oxford, alongside Jowett and Green.

2. Critique of Kant and Hegel

Along with T.H. Green (1836-1882), Caird was one of the first generation of British idealists, whose philosophical work was largely in reaction to the then-dominant empiricist and associationist views of Alexander Bain (1818-1903) and J.S. Mill. He had, however, an ability of literary expression which Green did not possess; he was also more inclined to discuss questions by the method of tracing the historical development of the ideas involved. But while Green died at the early age of 47, Caird enjoyed a relatively long and productive life. It is, in part, for this reason that he exercised such a strong influence—particularly on the relation of philosophy and religion—on later idealists such as John Watson (1847-1939) and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923). Though often considered to be Hegelian, Caird was arguably more profoundly influenced by Kant, although he was far from an uncritical reader.

Caird's first major work was A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Kant (1877), focusing on the Critique of Pure Reason and the Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics. It was superseded in 1889 by The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant (two volumes) in which Caird wished to show the relation of the three Critiques and the continuity in the movement of Kant's thought. In general, Caird was convinced that, though Kant had inaugurated a new era in philosophy with his attempt to integrate the a priori and the a posteriori, he failed to carry out this task fully. It was here that Caird's idealism took over. In these volumes on Kant, Caird sought "to display in the very argument of the great metaphysician, who was supposed to have cut the world in two with a hatchet, an almost involuntary but continuous and inevitable regression towards objective organic unity." Thus, he argued that "Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism." (1877, p. 667)

A sympathetic exposition of Hegel's philosophy is contained in his monograph on Hegel (1883) and, in 1885, his Social Philosophy and Religion of Comte (based on a collection of articles that had been previously published in the magazine, Contemporary Review) appeared. In these two works, Caird critically interprets these authors on lines of his own. Concerning Comte, for example, Caird writes that there cannot be a 'religion of Humanity' that is not, at the same time, a religion of God. In his treatment of Hegel, as of Kant, Caird's purpose was to show that there is a center of unity to which the mind must come back out of all differences, however varied and alien in appearance. The analysis was preliminary to reconstruction.

3. Philosophical Style

Caird's way of philosophizing differed from that of many of his contemporaries. It was consistently and even obtrusively constructive. According to Caird, "the true manner of honoring a thinker is to force oneself to understand him from his own point of view," and only then "to submit his ideas to as objective an examination as possible." Thus, he seized on the truths contained in the authors with whom he dealt, and was only incidentally concerned with their errors. One of the results of this, however, was that Caird's own views are often to be found only indirectly--that is, in his exposition and commentary of the views of others.

4. Evolution and Religion

Like many other idealists, such as D.G. Ritchie (1853-1903), Caird was concerned to show the relation of evolutionary theory to the development of thought and culture. His first set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Religion (2 volumes, 1893), deals less than his other works with an exposition of the views of other philosophers. These lectures focussed on the possibility of a science of religion and the nature of religion from Greek times, but were especially centered on the development of the Christian faith through to the Reformation. Caird shows the spiritual sense of humanity as at first dominated by the object, but constrained by its own abstractions to swing around so as to fall under the sway of the subject.

In 1904 Caird's second set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers,appeared. Here, he provides again an evolutionary account of religious conceptions (e.g., the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity) toward a 'reflective religion' or theology. The story of Greek philosophy, which Caird considered mainly (but not exclusively) in its relation to theology, was carried from Plato through Aristotle, the Stoics, and Philo, to Plotinus and--in the final lecture--to Christian theology and St. Augustine.

In general, Caird's views on religion were importantly related to his understanding of ethics, and Caird borrows from Hegel (and Goethe) the ethical idea of self sacrifice, or "dying to live," which was to have an important role in the work of Bosanquet. Caird consistently emphasized the importance of religion, and that a genuine metaphysics must be able to provide an account of it.

5. References and Further Reading

  • The Collected Works of Edward Caird, 12 Volumes, Ed. and Introd. Colin Tyler, Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press, 1999.
  • A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Kant, with an Historical Introduction. Glasgow: J. Maclehose, 1877.
  • The Problem of Philosophy at the Present Time: an Introductory Address Delivered to the Philosophical Society of the University of Edinburgh. Glasgow, James Maclehose & sons, 1881. (43 p.)
  • Hegel, Philadelphia: J. B. Lippincott and co.; Edinburgh: W. Blackwood and sons, 1883.
  • The Social Philosophy and Religion of Comte. Glasgow: J. Maclehose and sons, 1885. New York, Macmillan, 1885.
  • The Moral Aspect of the Economical Problem; Presidential Address to the Ethical Society. London, Swan Sonnenschein, Lowrey & Co., 1888. (18 p.)
  • The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, Glasgow: J. Maclehose & sons, 1889; New York: Macmillan, 1889. 2 v.
  • Essays on Literature and Philosophy, Glasgow, J. Maclehose and sons, 1892. 2 v. [v. 1. Dante in his relation to the theology and ethics of the Middle Ages. Goethe and philosophy. Rousseau. Wordsworth. The problem of philosophy at the present time. The genius of Carlyle; v. 2. Cartesianism. Metaphysic.]
  • The Evolution of Religion. 2 v., Glasgow: James Maclehose, 1893; New York: Macmillan, 1893. [Gifford lectures; 1890/1891-1891/1892]
  • Address on Plato's Republic as the Earliest Educational Treatise, Delivered by Edward Caird at the Closing Ceremony of the Session 1893-94. Bangor: Jarvis & Foster, 1894 (22 p.)
  • The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers. 2 v., Glasgow: J. Maclehose and sons, 1904. [Gifford lectures, Glasgow; 1900/1901 and 1901-1902].
  • Idealism and the Theory of Knowledge. London: Henry Frowde, 1903 (14 p.)
  • Lay Sermons and Addresses : Delivered in the Hall of Balliol College, Oxford. Glasgow : J. Maclehose; New York: Macmillan, 1907.

The standard assessment of Caird's work is:

  • The Life and Philosophy of Edward Caird by Sir Henry Jones and John Henry Muirhead. Glasgow: Maclehose, Jackson and co., 1921.

The IEP desires a newer and more detailed article on Caird.

Author Information

Revised by William Sweet

Donoso Cortes, Juan

Juan Donoso Cortés (1809—1853)

CortesJDJuan Donoso Cortés, parliamentary statesman, diplomat, government minister, royal counselor, theologian, and political theorist, may not be well known among modern political philosophers. However, his ideas had an enormous influence in the spheres of politics and religion in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. Donoso’s theories were uniquely influential in shaping the ideological trajectory that began with the reaction against the Enlightenment and the French Revolution in the eighteenth century and culminated in the rise of fascism in the twentieth century. This Spanish Catholic and conservative thinker was the philosophical heir of Joseph de Maistre, one of the most prominent reactionary conservative thinkers of the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries. Even though his life was short and his works few in number, Donoso's contribution to modern political philosophy and theology cannot be ignored if we wish to have a more complete understanding of the ideas and actions that have shaped Europe and the Roman Church in recent centuries. His most notable idea—the theory on dictatorship—was Donoso’s most significant and unique contribution to modern political thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Philosophical Development and Context
  2. View of Human Nature
  3. Theory of Dictatorship
    1. Religious Dictatorship
    2. Political Dictatorship
  4. Views on Violence
  5. Views on History
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Philosophical Development and Context

In the early years of his life, Donoso's thinking was deeply influenced by the philosophes of the Enlightenment. His education was thoroughly grounded in the study of such Enlightenment thinkers as Rousseau, Montesquieu, Voltaire, and Diderot. It was only in the last years of his life that Donoso distinguished himself as a standard bearer of an ideological camp that stood in complete opposition to the philosophes. By the year 1848 Donoso was firmly in the camp of such contre-philosophes as Joseph de Maistre and Louis de Bonald.

Until the European revolution of 1848, the primary concern of reactionary conservative thinkers was the restoration of the pre-1789 monarchical ancien régime. The authority and hierarchical order that were the centerpieces of conservative thought, were seen only in the context of restoring and preserving a monarchical régime. The revolution of 1848 exposed the inability of many of the European monarchies to maintain authority and hierarchical order. Donoso was one of the first and most vociferous of conservative thinkers to acknowledge this. While like de Maistre he was something of a romantic medievalist who advocated a hierarchical social order, with the Pope of Rome at the head of that order wielding absolute spiritual and temporal power while all other temporal and ecclesiastical authorities ruled as his deputies, he was also a realist who could strategically adapt his ideology to contemporary exigencies. He was the first conservative thinker to develop an alternative theory that posited a different model of régime calculated to achieve the restoration and maintenance of the authority and hierarchical order that all conservatives saw as the foundation of civilization. This was his theory on dictatorship. Even though Donoso was always an ardent monarchist, like his precursor de Maistre, he was also enough of a political realist to know that the ultimate goal of a stable social order based on obedience to infallible authority and adherence to a rigid hierarchy of rank and privilege could be achieved by other means, if necessary. If monarchies were too feeble to maintain such a social order, then other forms of government, more harsh in nature, need to be instituted in order to subjugate human beings.

2. View of Human Nature

Like de Maistre, Donoso viewed human beings as essentially and naturally depraved and irrational. To Donoso, human beings are so irredeemably corrupt in moral capacity and intellectually drawn to absurdity that they must be ruled with an iron fist. All social and religious order depends upon the will of those who rule to demand and impose obedience to their dictates and belief in their teachings as well as upon the willingness of subjects to obey and believe their rulers, both secular and religious. Civilization, according to Donoso, can only be preserved through the imposition and acceptance of political and religious commands and dogmas. These commands and dogmas are the repressive mechanisms Donoso held as essential to the survival and preservation of civilization, especially that mode of civilization which Donoso called "Catholic." Repression, said Donoso, is one of the most essential elements of civilization. For Donoso, no amount of free and open discussion could ever arrive at any modicum of truth. He saw truth as revealed by God and mediated through God's chosen instrument, the Catholic Church and it's Supreme Pontiff. Discussion only opens the door to doubt, confusion, and discord thus preparing the ground for socialism. Discussion, which Donoso held as the cornerstone of liberalism, creates a belief vacuum that can only be filled by Christ or Antichrist, by Catholicism or socialism. In a begrudging sort of way, Donoso respected socialism more than liberalism because he saw the former as more akin to Catholicism, as something offering human beings a set of dogmatic beliefs. Liberalism can only offer doubt and uncertainty.

3. Theory of Dictatorship

In his Speech on Dictatorship, Donoso described two different types of repression which he saw as necessary for the survival and maintenance of civilization—political and religious. These two forms of repression must exist in an equilibrium in order to be effective. With a decline in religious repression must come a corresponding and proportional rise in political repression, and vice versa. As the "thermometer" of religious repression falls, the "thermometer" of political repression must rise; and as the "thermometer" of political repression falls, so the "thermometer" of religious repression must rise. All political and religious régimes must be repressive if political and religious order are to endure. Donoso emphasized that the legitimacy of a régime is not based upon heredity, but upon the capacity of a régime to be repressive. This constituted a major shift in conservative thinking. Concern was not focused as much on who should rule, but on how rule is to be exercised. While authority and hierarchical order remained the conservative ideal, Donoso introduced a degree of realistic pragmatism to how this ideal could be achieved and preserved. This shift had ominous consequences in the twentieth century since the door was opened to more radical and ruthless forms of political and religious control.

a. Religious Dictatorship

In the religious arena, Donoso's ideas on authority influenced the life of the Roman Catholic Church for over a century. Again echoing the views of de Maistre, Donoso thought that infallibility is an essential characteristic of authority. Authority is synonymous with infallibility. The power to command behavior and impose beliefs is not subject to error and must not be seen as subject to error. Without the exercise of and belief in infallible authority, Donoso thought that people and societies would sink into a morass of confusion, doubt, and error.

Donoso's theory on infallibility helped to lay the foundation for the doctrine of papal infallibility that was promulgated by Pope Pius IX in 1870 at the end of the First Vatican Council. His advice was sought by Pius IX through the papal nuncio to France in the early 1850s, Rafaello Cardinal Fornari, with regard to the drawing up of a list of religious and philosophical propositions that were to be condemned as heretical. Donoso's loathing for democracy, freedom of thought, freedom of speech, freedom of religion, rationalism, liberalism, socialism, pluralism, freedom of expression, and tolerance was reflected in his Letter to Cardinal Fornari. The ideas asserted in this letter appeared in Pius IX's decree the Syllabus of Errors.

The repressive methods of governance advocated by Donoso in his theory on dictatorship also influenced the development of a papal régime that rested upon the absolute exercise of power by the pope over the Church. Donoso's theories contributed to the development of a totalitarian ideology of papal supremacy and authority that dominated the Church until the Second Vatican Council in the early 1960s. A dictatorial papal régime was established by Pius IX that lasted through and reached its zenith during the pontificate of Pius XII. The Church endured a form of régime and a vision that pitted it in a holy war against modernity. His theories helped to shape the ideas and vocabulary that justified the establishment of a strong and centralized papal régime and the persecution of dissident and progressive Catholic thinkers—"modernists"— who sought to bring about a reconciliation between Christianity and the modern world.

b. Political Dictatorship

In the political arena, Donoso's influence was just as ominous. His theory of dictatorship and his critique of liberal democratic parliamentarianism significantly influenced the thinking of the twentieth century German conservative political theorist Carl Schmitt. Schmitt figured prominently in the development of the legal principles and structures of the Nazi régime. Schmitt's critique of parliamentary democracy rests heavily upon arguments first developed by Donoso. Furthermore, Schmitt's depiction of politics as a constant struggle of friends against enemies reflects Donoso's quasi-Manichæan view of politics as a war between Catholic civilization and philosophical civilization. Donoso's notion of infallible authority resonated in the Nazi Führerprinzip, the Italian fascist principle of Ducismo, and the principle of Caudillaje of the Franco régime in Spain (1936-75). The emphasis Donoso placed on infallible authority, his contempt of parliamentary democracy, and his support of dictatorial rule were common features of both conservative authoritarian as well as fascist régimes. Donoso's ideas were held in high esteem in Spain during the time of the Franco dictatorship and were also reflected in other conservative authoritarian régimes in Portugal under Salazar and Caetano, France under Pétain (the Vichy régime), Austria under Dollfuss and Schuschnigg, and Hungary under Horthy.

4. Views on Violence

Donoso's theory on sacrifices, developed in his Ensayo sobre el catolicismo, el liberalismo y el socialismo, endorsed violence as a social necessity. The spilling of blood by the State is essential in keeping the repressive equilibrium required to maintain a society. For every drop of blood spilled in crime, there must be an equal amount of blood spilled in the name of justice if authority and order are to be preserved. Criminal violence must be balanced with just violence; the violence that promotes evil must be met with the violence that promotes the good. Donoso saw human beings as so morally depraved and feeble in intellect that they require dictatorial rulers to regulate their behavior, priests to tell then what to believe and think, and executioners to punish them when they waver or depart from the commanded norms of behavior, thought, and belief. Kings, priests, and executioners are the pillars of civilization.

5. Views on History

Donoso's view of history reflect the influence of St. Augustine, Vico, and Hegel. It combines the eschatological perspective of Augustine with the historical cycles of Vico and the dialectical process of Hegel. History is a process of the unfolding of a divine plan guided by Providence toward a specific end, which is the triumph of good over evil, of Catholic civilization over philosophical civilization. The process advances in cycles wherein the recurrent theme of good against evil is played out in a dialectical manner until the end is reached. Each cycle in the dialectical process ends with what Donoso called the "supernatural triumph of good over evil." The action of divine Providence is essential in this process. Just as the executioner turns an evil into a good by replacing criminal violence with just violence, so Providence turns the natural triumph of evil into the supernatural triumph of the good. Donoso saw the natural triumph of evil in Jesus' death as a supernatural triumph at the same time. The evil of the crucifixion accomplished the good of human redemption. The evil that afflicts can also be a good that strengthens and saves. The evil of sin allows God to display the good that is manifested in his justice and his mercy. History is the playing out of this drama in a cyclic and dialectically structured process guided by divine Providence toward a definite conclusion-the ultimate triumph of good over evil. Catholic civilization, which Donoso depicted as totally good, will ultimately crush and triumph over that evil he called philosophical civilization.

Donoso can also be seen as a modern-day Cassandra uttering prophecies of apocalyptic doom. He saw the development of modern technology, symbolized by the telegraph for him, and the establishment of mass permanent armies and police forces as potential instruments in the hands of a future godless and socialistic tyranny. All of his efforts in the arenas of politics, philosophy, and religion were aimed at preventing the rise of such an evil. Revolution had to be met with counterrevolution, anarchy with dictatorship, freethinking with dogma, doubt with certainty, and discussion with decree. The ultimate battle for Donoso was to be a quasi-Manichæan struggle between Catholicism and socialism, or Catholic civilization and philosophical civilization, two systems of belief in a combat to the death for the control of societies and souls.

6. References and Further Reading

Works by Juan Donoso Cortés:

  • Juan Donoso Cortés, Antologia de Juan Donoso Cortés, edited by Francisco Elías de Tejada (Madrid: Editorial Tradicionalista, 1953)
  • Artículos políticos en "El Porvenir," edited by Federico Súarez Verdeguer (Pamplona: Ediciones Universidad de Navarra, 1992
  • Donoso Cortés y la fundación de "El Heraldo" y "El Sol," edited by Federico Súarez Verdeguer (Pamplona: Ediciones Universidad de Navarra, 1986)
  • Essai sur le catholicisme, le libéralisme et le socialisme, introduction by Arnaud Imatz (Bouère: Editions Dominique Martin Morin, 1986).
    • French translation of the Ensayo sobre el catolicismo, el liberalismo y el socialismo
  • Essay on Catholicism, Liberalism, and Order, translated by Madeleine Vincent Goddard, edited J. C. Reville (New York: Joseph F. Wagner, 1925).
    • English translation of the Ensayo
  • Essays on Catholicism, Liberalism, and Socialism, translated by Rev. William McDonald (Dublin: M. H. Gill and Son, 1879).
    • The second English translation of the Ensayo
  • Der Staat Gottes, translated by Ludwig Fischer (Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1966).
    • German translation of the Ensayo
  • Obras completas de Don Juan Donoso Cortés, 2 vols., edited by Juan Juretschke (Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1946)
  • Obras completas de Donoso Cortés, 2 vols., edited by Carlos Valverde, S.J., (Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1970)
  • Selected Works of Juan Donoso Cortés, translated, edited, and introduced by Jeffrey P. Johnson (Wesport: Greenwood Press, 2000)
  • "Speech on Dictatorship," in Catholic Political Thought: 1789-1848, edited by Bela Menczer (South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1962).

Works on Juan Donoso Cortés:

  • Gabriel de Armas, Donoso Cortés: su sentido trascendente de la vida (Madrid: Colección Cálamo, 1953)
  • Orestes Brownson, Orestes Brownson: Selected Essays, edited by Russell Kirk (Chicago: Regnery, 1955)
  • Catholic Encyclopedia, 1909 edition, s.v. "Donoso Cortés," by Condé B. Pallen; Jules Chaix-Ruy Donoso Cortés: Théologien de l'histoire et prophète (Paris: Beauchesne, 1956)
  • Alois Dempf, Christliche Staatsphilosophie in Spanien (Salzburg: Verlag Anton Pustet, 1937)
  • John T. Graham, Donoso Cortés: Utopian Romanticist and Political Realist (Columbia: University of Missouri Press, 1974)
  • R. A. Herrera, Donoso Cortés: Cassandra of the Age (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1995)
  • Ramon Menéndez Pidal, La historia de España: la era Isabelina y el sexenio democrático (1834-1874), vol. XXXIV (Madrid: Espasa Calpe, 1981)
  • Raúl Sánchez Abelenda, La teoría del poder en el pensamiento político de Juan Donoso Cortés (Buenos Aires: Editorial Universitaria de Buenos Aires, 1969)
  • Carl Schmitt, La interpretación europea de Donoso Cortés (Madrid: Rialp, 1953); Political Theology, translated by George Schwab (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1985)
  • Edmund Schramm, Donoso Cortés: ejemplo del pensamiento de la tradición, (Madrid: Publicaciones Españolas, 1961); Donoso Cortés: Su vida y su pensamiento (Madrid: Espasa Calpe, 1936)
  • Federico Súarez Verdeger, Introducción a Donoso Cortés (Madrid: Rialp, 1964)
  • Carlos Valverde, S.J., "Introducción" in Obras completas de Donoso Cortés, vol. 1, edited by Carlos Valverde, S.J. ( Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1970); Dietmar Westemeyer, Donoso Cortés, hombre de estado y teólogo, translated by J. S. Mazpule (Madrid: Editora Nacional, 1957)
  • Frederick D. Wilhelmsen, Christianity and Political Philosophy (Athens: University of Georgia Press, 1978); Francis G. Wilson, Political Thought in National Spain (Champaign: Stipes, 1967).

Author Information

Jeffrey P. Johnson
U. S. A.

Hegel: Social and Political Thought

Hegel: Social and Political Thought

hegelGeorg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770-1831) is one of the greatest systematic thinkers in the history of Western philosophy. In addition to epitomizing German idealist philosophy, Hegel boldly claimed that his own system of philosophy represented an historical culmination of all previous philosophical thought. Hegel's overall encyclopedic system is divided into the science of Logic, the philosophy of Nature, and the philosophy of Spirit. Of most enduring interest are his views on history, society, and the state, which fall within the realm of Objective Spirit. Some have considered Hegel to be a nationalistic apologist for the Prussian State of the early 19th century, but his significance has been much broader, and there is no doubt that Hegel himself considered his work to be an expression of the self-consciousness of the World Spirit of his time. At the core of Hegel's social and political thought are the concepts of freedom, reason, self-consciousness, and recognition. There are important connections between the metaphysical or speculative articulation of these ideas and their application to social and political reality, and one could say that the full meaning of these ideas can be grasped only with a comprehension of their social and historical embodiment. The work that explicates this concretizing of ideas, and which has perhaps stimulated as much controversy as interest, is the Philosophy of Right (Philosophie des Rechts), which will be a main focus of this essay.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Political Writings
  3. The Jena Writings (1802-06)
  4. The Phenomenology of Spirit
  5. Logic and Political Theory
  6. The Philosophy of Right
    1. Abstract Right
    2. Morality
    3. Ethical Life
      1. The Family
      2. Civil Society
      3. The State
        1. Constitutional Law
        2. International Law
        3. World History
  7. Closing Remarks
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Hegel in German and in English Translation
    2. Works on Hegel's Social and Political Philosophy

1. Biography

G.W.F. Hegel was born in Stuttgart in 1770, the son of an official in the government of the Duke of Württemberg. He was educated at the Royal Highschool in Stuttgart from 1777-88 and steeped in both the classics and the literature of the European Enlightenment. In October, 1788 Hegel began studies at a theological seminary in Tübingen, the Tüberger Stift, where he became friends with the poet Hölderlin and philosopher Friedrich Schelling, both of whom would later become famous. In 1790 Hegel received an M.A. degree, one year after the fall of the Bastille in France, an event welcomed by these young idealistic students. Shortly after graduation, Hegel took a post as tutor to a wealthy Swiss family in Berne from 1793-96. In 1797, with the help of his friend Hölderlin, Hegel moved to Frankfurt to take on another tutorship. During this time he wrote unpublished essays on religion which display a certain radical tendency of thought in his critique of orthodox religion.

In January 1801, two years after the death of his father, Hegel finished with tutoring and went to Jena where he took a position as Privatdozent (unsalaried lecturer) at the University of Jena, where Hegel's friend Schelling had already held a university professorship for three years. There Hegel collaborated with Schelling on a Critical Journal of Philosophy (Kritisches Journal der Philosophie) and he also published a piece on the differences between the philosophies of Fichte and Schelling (Differenz des Fichte'schen und Schelling'schen Systems der Philosophie) in which preference was consistently expressed for the latter thinker. After having attained a professorship in 1805, Hegel published his first major work, the Phenomenology of Spirit (Phänomenologie des Geistes, 1807) which was delivered to the publisher just at the time of the occupation of Jena by Napoleon's armies. With the closing of the University, due to the victory of the French in Prussia, Hegel had to seek employment elsewhere and so he took a job as editor of a newspaper in Bamberg, Bavaria in 1807 (Die Bamberger Zeitung) followed by a move to Nuremberg in 1808 where Hegel became headmaster of a preparatory school (Gymnasium), roughly equivalent to a high school, and also taught philosophy to the students there until 1816. During this time Hegel married, had children, and published his Science of Logic (Wissenschaft der Logik) in three volumes.

One year following the defeat of Napoleon at Waterloo (1815), Hegel took the position of Professor of Philosophy at the University of Heidelberg where he published his first edition of the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Outline (Encyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften im Grundrisse, 1817). In 1818 he became Professor of Philosophy at the University of Berlin, through the invitation of the Prussion minister von Altenstein (who had introduced many liberal reforms in Prussia until the fall of Napoleon), and Hegel taught there until he died in 1831. Hegel lectured on various topics in philosophy, most notably on history, art, religion, and the history of philosophy and he became quite famous and influential. He held public positions as a member of the Royal Examination Commission of the Province of Brandenberg and also as a councellor in the Ministry of Education. In 1821 he published the Philosophy of Right (Philosophie des Rechts) and in 1830 was given the honor of being elected Rector of the University. On November 14, 1831 Hegel died of cholera in Berlin, four months after having been decorated by Friedrich Wilhelm III of Prussia.

2. Political Writings

Apart from his philosophical works on history, society, and the state, Hegel wrote several political tracts most of which were not published in his lifetime but which are significant enough in connection to the theoretical writings to deserve some mention. (These are published in English translation in Hegel's Political Writings and Political Writings, listed in the bibliography of works by Hegel below.)

Hegel's very first political work was on "On the Recent Domestic Affairs of Wurtemberg" (Über die neuesten innern Verhältnisse Württembergs…, 1798) which was neither completed nor published. In it Hegel expresses the view that the constitutional structure of Wurtemberg requires fundamental reform. He condemns the absolutist rule of Duke Ferdinand along with the narrow traditionalism and legal positivism of his officials and welcomes the convening of the Estates Assembly, while disagreeing with the method of election in the Diet. In contrast to the existing system of oligarchic privilege, Hegel argues that the Diet needs to be based on popular election through local town councils, although this should not be done by granting suffrage to an uneducated multitude. The essay ends inconclusively on the appropriate method of political representation.

A quite long piece of about 100 pages, The German Constitution (Die Verfassung Deutchlands) was written and revised by Hegel between 1799 and 1802 and was not published until after his death in 1893. This piece provides an analysis and critique of the constitution of the German Empire with the main theme being that the Empire is a thing of the past and that appeals for a unified German state are anachronistic. Hegel finds a certain hypocrisy in German thinking about the Empire and a gap between theory and practice in the German constitution. Germany was no longer a state governed by law but rather a plurality of independent political entities with disparate practices. Hegel stresses the need to recognize that the realities of the modern state necessitate a strong public authority along with a populace that is free and unregimented. The principle of government in the modern world is constitutional monarchy, the potentialities of which can be seen in Austria and Prussia. Hegel ends the essay on an uncertain note with the idea that Germany as a whole could be saved only by some Machiavellian genius.

The essay "Proceedings of the Estates Assembly in the Kingdom of Württemberg, 1815-1816" was published in 1817 in the Heidelbergische Jahrbücher. In it Hegel commented on sections of the official report of the Diet of Württemberg, focusing on the opposition by the Estates to the King's request for ratification of a new constitutional charter that recognized recent liberalizing changes and reforms. Hegel sided with King Frederick and criticized the Estates as being reactionary in their appeal to old customary laws and feudal property rights. There has been controversy over whether Hegel here was trying to gain favor with the King in order to attain a government position. However, Hegel's favoring a sovereign kingdom of Wurtemberg over the German Empire and the need for a constitutional charter that is more rational than the previous are quite continuous with the previous essays. A genuine state needs a strong and effective central public authority, and in resisting the Estates are trying to live in the feudal past. Moreover, Hegel is not uncritical of the King's constitutional provisions and finds deficiencies in the exclusion of members of professions from the Estates Assembly as well as in the proposal for direct suffrage in representation, which treats citizens like unintegrated atomic units rather than as members of a political community.

The last of Hegel's political tracts, "The English Reform Bill," was written in installments in 1831 for the ministerial newspaper, the Preussische Staatszeitung, but was interrupted due to censure by the Prussian King because of the perception of its being overly critical and anti-English. As a result, the remainder of the work was printed independently and distributed discretely. Hegel's main line of criticism is that the proposed English reforms of suffrage will not make much of a difference in the distribution of political power and may only create a power struggle between the rising group of politicians and the traditional ruling class. Moreover, there are deep problems in English society that cannot be addressed by the proposed electoral reforms, including political corruption in the English burroughs, the selling of seats in parliament, and the general oligarchic nature of social reality including the wide disparities between wealth and poverty, Ecclesiastical patronage, and conditions in Ireland. While Hegel supports the idea of reform with its appeal to rational change as against the "positivity" of customary law, traditionalism and privilege, he thinks that universalizing suffrage with a property qualification without a thorough reform of the system of Common Law and the existing social conditions will only be perceived as token measures leading to greater disenchantment among the newly enfranchised and possibly inclinations to violent revolution. Hegel claims that national pride keeps the English from studying and following the reforms of the European Continent or seriously reflecting upon and grasping the nature of government and legislation.

There are several overall themes that reoccur in these political writings and that connect with some of the main lines of thought in Hegel's theoretical works. First, there is the contrast between the attitude of legal positivism and the appeal to the law of reason. Hegel consistently displays a "political rationalism" which attacks old concepts and attitudes that no longer apply to the modern world. Old constitutions stemming from the Feudal era are a confused mixture of customary laws and special privileges that must give way to the constitutional reforms of the new social and political world that has arrived in the aftermath of the French Revolution. Second, reforms of old constitutions must be thorough and radical, but also cautious and gradual. This might sound somewhat inconsistent, but for Hegel a reform is radical due to a fundamental change in direction, not the speed of such change. Hegel suggests that customary institutions not be abolished too quickly for there must be some congruence and continuity with the existing social conditions. Hegel rejects violent popular action and sees the principal force for reform in governments and the estates assemblies, and he thinks reforms should always stress legal equality and the public welfare. Third, Hegel emphasizes the need for a strong central government, albeit without complete centralized control of public administration and social relations. Hegel here anticipates his later conception of civil society (bürgerliche Gesellschaft), the social realm of individual autonomy where there is significant local self-governance. The task of government is not to thoroughly bureaucratize civil society but rather to provide oversight, regulation, and when necessary intervention. Fourth, Hegel claims that representation of the people must be popular but not atomistic. The democratic element in a state is not its sole feature and it must be institutionalized in a rational manner. Hegel rejects universal suffrage as irrational because it provides no means of mediation between the individual and the state as a whole. Hegel believed that the masses lacked the experience and political education to be directly involved in national elections and policy matters and that direct suffrage leads to electoral indifference and apathy. Fifth, while acknowledging the importance of a division of powers in the public authority, Hegel does not appeal to a conception of separation and balance of powers. He views the estates assemblies, which safeguard freedom, as essentially related to the monarch and also stresses the role of civil servants and members of the professions, both in ministerial positions and in the assemblies. The monarchy, however, is the central supporting element in the constitutional structure because the monarch is invested with the sovereignty of the state. However, the power of the monarch is not despotical for he exercises authority through universal laws and statutes and is advised and assisted by a ministry and civil service, all members of which must meet educational requirements.

3. The Jena Writings (1802-06)

Hegel wrote several pieces while at the University of Jena that point in the direction of some of the main theses of the Philosophy of Right. The first was entitled "On the Scientific Modes of Treatment of Natural Law–Its Place in Practical Philosophy and Its Relationship to the Positive Science of Law" (Über die wissenschaftlichen Behandlungsarten des Naturrechts…), published originally in the Kritisches Journal der Philosophie in 1802, edited jointly by Hegel and Schelling. In this piece, usually referred to as the essay on Natural Law, Hegel criticizes both the empirical and formal approaches to natural law, as exemplified in British and Kantian philosophy respectively. Empiricism reaches conclusions that are limited by the particularities of its contexts and materials and thus cannot provide universally valid propositions regarding the concepts of various social and political institutions or of the relation of reflective consciousness to social and political experience. Formalist conclusions, on the other hand, are too insubstantial and abstract in failing to properly link human reason concretely to human experience. Traditional natural law theories are based on an abstract rationalism and the attempts of Rousseau, Kant, and Fichte to remedy this through their various ethical conceptions fail to overcome abstractness. For Hegel, the proper method of philosophical science must link concretely the development of the human mind and its rational powers to actual experience. Moreover, the concept of a social and political community must transcend the instrumentalizing of the state.

Hegel's work entitled "The System of Ethical Life" (System der Sittlichkeit) was written in 1802-03 and first published in its entirety by Georg Lasson in 1913 in a volume entitled Schriften zur Politik und Rechtsphilosophie. In this work, Hegel develops a philosophical theory of social and political development that correlates with the self-development of essential human powers. Historically, humans begin in an immediate relation to nature and their social existence takes the form of natürliche Sittlichkeit, i.e., a non-selfconscious relation to nature and to others. However, the satisfaction of human desires leads to their reproduction and multiplication and leads to the necessity for labor, which induces transformation in the human world and people's connections to it. This process leads to a self-realization that undermines the original naïve unity with nature and others and to the formation of overtly cooperative endeavors, e.g., in the making and use of tools. Another result of labor is the emergence of private property as an embodiment of human personality as well as of sets of legal relationships that institutionalize property ownership, exchange, etc., and deal with crimes against property. Furthermore, disparities in property and power lead to relationships of subordination and the use of the labor of others to satisfy one's increasingly complex and expanded desires. Gradually, a system of mutual dependence, a "system of needs," develops, and along with the increasing division of labor there also develops class differentiations reflecting the types of labor or activity taken up by members of each class, which Hegel classifies into the agricultural, acquisitive, and administerial classes. However, despite relations of interdependence and cooperation the members of society experience social connections as a sort of blind fate without some larger system of control which is provided by the state which regulates the economic life of society. The details of the structure of the state are unclear in this essay, but what is clear is that for Hegel the state provides an increased rationality to social practices, much in the sense that the later German sociologist Max Weber (1864-1920) would articulate how social practices become more rational by being codified and made more predictable.

The manuscripts entitled Realphilosophie are based on lectures Hegel delivered at Jena University in 1803-04 (Realphilosophie I) and 1805-06 (Realphilosophie II), and were originally published by Johannes Hoffmeister in 1932. These writings cover much of the same ground as the System der Sittlichkeit in explicating a philosophy of mind and human experience in relation to human social and political development. Some of the noteworthy ideas in these writings are the role and significance of language for social consciousness, for giving expression to a people (Volk) and for the comprehending of and mastery of the world, and the necessity and consequences of the fragmentation of primordial social relationships and patterns as part of the process of human development. Also, there is a reiteration of the importance of property relations as crucial to social recognition and how there would be no security of property or recognition of property rights if society were to remain a mere multitude of families. Such security requires a system of control over the "struggle for recognition" through interpersonal norms, rules, and juridical authority provided by the nation state. Moreover, Hegel repeats the need for strong state regulation of the economy, which if left to its own workings is blind to the needs of the social community. The economy, especially through the division of labor, produces fragmentation and diminishment of human life (compare Marx on alienation) and the state must not only address this phenomenon but also provide the means for the people's political participation to further the development of social self-consciousness. In all of this Hegel appears to be providing a philosophical account of modern developments both in terms of the tensions and conflicts that are new to modernity as well as in the progressive movements of reform found under the influence of Napoleon.

Finally, Hegel also discusses the forms of government, the three main types being tyranny, democracy, and hereditary monarchy. Tyranny is found typically in primitive or undeveloped states, democracy exists in states where there is the realization of individual identity but no split between the public and private person, and hereditary monarchy is the appropriate form of political authority in the modern world in providing strong central government along with a system of indirect representation through Estates. The relation of religion to the state is undeveloped in these writings, but Hegel is clear about the supereminent role of the state that stands above all else in giving expression to the Spirit (Geist) of a society in a sort of earthly kingdom of God, the realization of God in the world. True religion complements and supports this realization and thus cannot properly have supremacy over or be opposed to the state.

4. The Phenomenology of Spirit

The Phenomenology of Spirit (Die Phänomenologie des Geistes), published in 1807, is Hegel's first major comprehensive philosophical work. Originally intended to be the first part of his comprehensive system of science (Wissenschaft) or philosophy, Hegel eventually considered it to be the introduction to his system. This work provides what can be called a "biography of spirit," i.e., an account of the development of consciousness and self-consciousness in the context of some central epistemological, anthropological and cultural themes of human history. It has continuity with the works discussed above in examining the development of the human mind in relation to human experience but is more wide-ranging in also addressing fundamental questions about the meaning of perceiving, knowing, and other cognitive activities as well as of the nature of reason and reality. Given the focus of this essay, the themes of the Phenomenology to be discussed here are those directly relevant to Hegel's social and political thought.

One of the most widely discussed places in the Phenomenology is the chapter on "The Truth of Self-Certainty" which includes a subsection on "Independence and Dependence of Self-Consciousness: Lordship and Bondage." This section treats of the (somewhat misleadingly named) "master/slave" struggle which is taken by some, especially the Marxian-inspired, as a paradigm of all forms of social conflict, in particular the struggle between social classes. It is clear that Hegel intended the scenario to typify certain features of the struggle for recognition (Anerkennung) overall, be it social, personal, etc. The conflict between master and slave (which shall be referred to hereafter as lord and bondsman as more in keeping with Hegel's own terminology and the intended generic meaning) is one in which the historical themes of dominance and obedience, dependence and independence, etc., are philosophically introduced. Although this specific dialectic of struggle occurs only at the earliest stages of self-consciousness, it nonetheless sets up the main problematic for achieving realized self-consciousness–the gaining of self-recognition through the recognition of and by another, through mutual recognition.

According to Hegel, the relationship between self and otherness is the fundamental defining characteristic of human awareness and activity, being rooted as it is in the emotion of desire for objects as well as in the estrangement from those objects, which is part of the primordial human experience of the world. The otherness that consciousness experiences as a barrier to its goal is the external reality of the natural and social world, which prevents individual consciousness from becoming free and independent. However, that otherness cannot be abolished or destroyed, without destroying oneself, and so ideally there must be reconciliation between self and other such that consciousness can "universalize" itself through the other. In the relation of dominance and subservience between two consciousnesses, say lord and bondsman, the basic problem for consciousness is the overcoming of its otherness, or put positively, the achieving of integration with itself. The relation between lord and bondsman leads to a sort of provisional, incomplete resolution of the struggle for recognition between distinct consciousnesses.

Hegel asks us to consider how a struggle between two distinct consciousnesses, let us say a violent "life-or-death" struggle, would lead to one consciousness surrendering and submitting to the other out of fear of death. Initially, the consciousness that becomes lord or master proves its freedom through willingness to risk its life and not submit to the other out of fear of death, and thus not identify simply with its desire for life and physical being. Moreover, this consciousness is given acknowledgement of its freedom through the submission and dependence of the other, which turns out paradoxically to be a deficient recognition in that the dominant one fails to see a reflection of itself in the subservient one. Adequate recognition requires a mirroring of the self through the other, which means that to be successful it must be mutual. In the ensuing relationship of lordship and bondage, furthermore, the bondsman through work and discipline (motivated by fear of dying at the hands of the master or lord) transforms his subservience into a mastery over his environment, and thus achieves a measure of independence. In objectifying himself in his environment through his labor the bondsman in effect realizes himself, with his transformed environment serving as a reflection of his inherently self-realizing activity. Thus, the bondsman gains a measure of independence in his subjugation out of fear of death. In a way, the lord represents death as the absolute subjugator, since it is through fear of this master, of the death that he can impose, that the bondsman in his acquiescence and subservience is placed into a social context of work and discipline. Yet despite, or more properly, because of this subjection the bondsman is able to attain a measure of independence by internalizing and overcoming those limitations which must be dealt with if he is to produce efficiently. However, this accomplishment, the self-determination of the bondsman, is limited and incomplete because of the asymmetry that remains in his relation to the lord. Self-consciousness is still fragmented, i.e., the objectification through labor that the bondsman experiences does not coincide with the consciousness of the lord whose sense of self is not through labor but through power over the bondsman and enjoyment of the fruits of the bondsman's labor. Only in a realm of ethical life can self-determination be fully self-conscious to the extent that universal freedom is reflected in the life of each individual member of society.

Thus, in the Phenomenology consciousness must move on through the phases of Stoicism, Skepticism, and the Unhappy Consciousness before engaging in the self-articulation of Reason, and it is not until the section "Objective Spirit: The Ethical Order" that the full universalization of self-consciousness is in principle to be met with. Here we find a shape of human existence where all men work freely, serving the needs of the whole community rather than of masters, and subject only to the "discipline of reason." This mode of ethical life, typified in ancient Greek democracy, also eventually disintegrates, as is expressed in the conflict between human and divine law and the tragic fate that is the outcome of this conflict illustrated in the story of Antigone. However, the ethical life described here is still in its immediacy and is therefore at a level of abstractness that falls short of the mediation of subjectivity and universality which is provided spiritually in revealed Christianity and politically in the modern state, which purportedly provides a solution to human conflict arising from the struggle for recognition. In any case, the rest of the Phenomenology is devoted to examinations of culture (including enlightenment and revolution), morality, religion, and finally, Absolute Knowing.

The dialectic of self-determination is, for Hegel, inherent in the very structure of freedom, and is the defining feature of Spirit (Geist). The full actualization of Spirit in the human community requires the progressive development of individuality which effectively begins with the realization in self-consciousness of the "truth of self-certainty" and culminates in the shape of a shared common life in an integrated community of love and Reason, based upon the realization of truths of incarnation, death, resurrection, and forgiveness as grasped in speculative Religion. The articulation Hegel provides in the Phenomenology, however, is very generic and is to be made concrete politically with the working out of a specific conception of the modern nation-state with its particular configuration of social and political institutions. It is to the latter that we must turn in order to see how these fundamental dialectical considerations take shape in the "solution" to the struggle for recognition in self-consciousness. However, before moving directly to Hegel's theory of the state, and history, some discussion of his Logic is in order.

5. Logic and Political Theory

The Logic constitutes the first part of Hegel's philosophical system as presented in his Encyclopedia. It was preceded by his larger work, The Science of Logic (Wissenschaft der Logik), published in 1812-16 in two volumes. The "Encyclopedia Logic" is a shorter version intended to function as part of an "outline," but it became longer in the course of the three published versions of 1817, 1827, and 1830. Also, the English translation by William Wallace contains additions from the notes of students who heard Hegel's lectures on this subject. (Reference to the paragraphs of the Encyclopedia will be made with the "¶" character.)

The structure of the Logic is triadic, reflecting the organization of the larger system of philosophy as well as a variety of other motifs, both internal and external to the Logic proper. The Logic has three divisions: the Doctrine of Being, the Doctrine of Essence, and the Doctrine of the Notion (or Concept). There are a number of logical categories in this work that are directly relevant to social and political theorizing. In the Doctrine of Being, for example, Hegel explains the concept of "being-for-self" as the function of self-relatedness in the resolving of opposition between self and other in the "ideality of the finite" (¶ 95-96). He claims that the task of philosophy is to bring out the ideality of the finite, and as will be seen later Hegel's philosophy of the state is intended to articulate the ideality of the state, i.e., its affirmative and infinite or rational features. In the Doctrine of Essence, Hegel explains the categories of actuality and freedom. He says that actuality is the unity of "essence and existence" (¶ 142) and argues that this does not rule out the actuality of ideas for they become actual by being realized in external existence. Hegel will have related points to make about the actuality of the idea of the state in society and history. Also, he defines freedom not in terms of contingency or lack of determination, as is popular, but rather as the "truth of necessity," i.e., freedom presupposes necessity in the sense that reciprocal action and reaction provide a structure for free action, e.g., a necessary relation between crime and punishment.

The Doctrine of the Notion (Begriff) is perhaps the most relevant section of the Logic to social and political theory due to its focus on the various dynamics of development. This section is subdivided into three parts: the subjective notion, the objective notion, and the idea which articulates the unity of subjective and objective. The first part, the subjective notion, contains three "moments" or functional parts: universality, particularity, and individuality (¶ 163ff). These are particularly important as Hegel will show how the functional parts of the state operate according to a progressive "dialectical" movement from the first to the third moments and how the state as a whole, as a functioning and integrated totality, gives expression to the concept of individuality (in ¶198 Hegel refers to the state as "a system of three syllogisms"). Hegel treats these relationships as logical judgments and syllogisms but they do not merely articulate how the mind must operate (subjectivity) but also explain actual relationships in reality (objectivity). In objective reality we find these logical/dialectical relationships in mechanism, chemism, and teleology. Finally, in the Idea, the correspondence of the notion or concept with objective reality, we have the truth of objects or objects as they ought to be, i.e., as they correspond to their proper concepts. The logical articulation of the Idea is very important to Hegel's explanation of the Idea of the state in modern history, for this provides the principles of rationality that guide the development of Spirit in the world and that become manifested in various ways in social and political life.

6. The Philosophy of Right

In 1821, Hegel's Philosophy of Right orginally appeared under the double title Naturrecht und Staatswissenschaften in Grundrisse; Grundlinien der Philosophie des Rechts (Natural Law and the Science of the State; Elements of the Philosophy of Right). The work was republished by Eduard Gans in 1833 and 1854 as part of Hegel's Werke, vol. viii and included additions from notes taken by students at Hegel's lectures. The English language translation of this work by T. M. Knox refers to these later editions as well as to an edition published in 1923 by Georg Lasson, which included corrections from previous editions.

The Philosophy of Right constitutes, along with Hegel's Philosophy of History, the penultimate section of his Encyclopedia, the section on Objective Spirit, which deals with the human world and its array of social rules and institutions, including the moral, legal, religious, economic, and political as well as marriage, the family, social classes, and other forms of human organization. The German word Recht is often translated as 'law', however, Hegel clearly intends the term to have a broader meaning that captures what we might call the good or just society, one that is "rightful" in its structure, composition, and practices.

In the Introduction to this work Hegel explains the concept of his philosophical undertaking along with the specific key concepts of will, freedom, and right. At the very beginning, Hegel states that the Idea of right, the concept together with its actualization, is the proper subject of the philosophical science of right (¶ 1). Hegel is emphatic that the study is scientific in that it deals in a systematic way with something essentially rational. He further remarks that the basis of scientific procedure in a philosophy of right is explicated in philosophical logic and presupposed by the former (¶ 2). Furthermore, Hegel is at pains to distinguish the historical or legal approach to "positive law" (Gesetz) and the philosophical approach to the Idea of right (Recht), the former involving mere description and compilation of laws as legal facts while the latter probes into the inner meaning and necessary determinations of law or right. For Hegel the justification of something, the finding of its inherent rationality, is not a matter of seeking its origins or longstanding features but rather of studying it conceptually.

However, there is one sense in which the origin of right is relevant to philosophical science and this is the free will. The free will is the basis and origin of right in the sense that mind or spirit (Geist) generally objectifies itself in a system of right (human social and political institutions) that gives expression to freedom, which Hegel says is both the substance and goal of right (¶ 4). This ethical life in the state consists in the unity of the universal and the subjective will. The universal will is contained in the Idea of freedom as its essence, but when considered apart from the subjective will can be thought of only abstractly or indeterminately. Considered apart from the subjective or particular will, the universal will is "the element of pure indeterminacy or that pure reflection of the ego into itself which involves the dissipation of every restriction and every content either immediately presented by nature, by needs, desires, and impulses, or given and determined by any means whatever" (¶ 5). In other words, the universal will is that moment in the Idea of freedom where willing is thought of as state of absolutely unrestrained volition, unfettered by any particular circumstances or limitations whatsoever–the pure form of willing. This is expressed in the modern libertarian view of completely uncoerced choice, the absence of restraint (or "negative liberty" as understood by Thomas Hobbes). The subjective will, on the other hand, is the principle of activity and realization that involves "differentiation, determination, and positing of a determinacy as a content and object" (¶ 6). This means that the will is not merely unrestrained in acting but that it actually can give expression to the doing or accomplishing of certain things, e.g., through talent or expertise (sometimes called "positive freedom"). The unity of both the moments of abstract universality (the will in-itself) and subjectivity or particularity (the will for-itself) is the concrete universal or true individuality (the will in-and-for-itself). According to Hegel, preservation of the distinction of these two moments in the unity (identity-in-difference) between universal and particular will is what produces rational self-determination of an ego, as well as the self-consciousness of the state as a whole. Hegel's conception of freedom as self-determination is just this unity in difference of the universal and subjective will, be it in the willing by individual persons or in the expressions of will by groups of individuals or collectivities. The "negative self-relation" of this freedom involves the subordination of the natural instincts, impulses, and desires to conscious reflection and to goals and purposes that are consciously chosen and that require commitment to rational principles in order to properly guide action.

The overall structure of the Philosophy of Right is quite remarkable in its "syllogistic" organization. The main division of the work corresponds to what Hegel calls the stages in the development of "the Idea of the absolutely free will," and these are Abstract Right, Morality, and Ethical Life. Each of these divisions is further subdivided triadically: under Abstract Right there is Property, Contract, and Wrong; under Morality falls Purpose and Responsibility, Intention and Welfare, and Good and Conscience; finally, under Ethical Life comes the Family, Civil Society, and the State. These last subdivisions are further subdivided into triads, with fourth level subdivisions occurring under Civil Society and the State. This triadic system of rubrics is no mere description of a static model of social and political life. Hegel claims that it gives expression to the conceptual development of Spirit in human society based upon the purely logical development of rationality provided in his Logic. Thus, it is speculatively based and not derivable from empirical survey, although the particularities of the system do indeed correspond to our experience and what we know about ourselves anthropologically, culturally, etc.

The transition in the Logic from universality to particularity to individuality (or concrete universality) is expressed in the social and political context in the conceptual transition from Abstract Right to Morality to Ethical Life. In the realm of Abstract Right, the will remains in its immediacy as an abstract universal that is expressed in personality and in the universal right to possession of external things in property. In the realm of Morality, the will is no longer merely "in-itself," or restricted to the specific characteristics of legal personality, but becomes free "for-itself," i.e., it is will reflected into itself so as to produce a self-consciousness of the will's infinity. The will is expressed, initially, in inner conviction and subsequently in purpose, intention, and conviction. As opposed to the merely juridical person, the moral agent places primary value on subjective recognition of principles or ideals that stand higher than positive law. At this stage, universality of a higher moral law is viewed as something inherently different from subjectivity, from the will's inward convictions and actions, and so in its isolation from a system of objectively recognized legal rules the willing subject remains "abstract, restricted, and formal" (¶ 108). Because the subject is intrinsically a social being who needs association with others in order to institutionalize the universal maxims of morality, maxims that cover all people, it is only in the realm of Ethical Life that the universal and the subjective will come into a unity through the objectification of the will in the institutions of the Family, Civil Society, and the State.

In what follows, we trace through Hegel's systematic development of the "stages of the will," highlighting only the most important points as necessary to get an overall view of this work.

a. Abstract Right

The subject of Abstract Right (Recht) is the person as the bearer or holder of individual rights. Hegel claims that this focus on the right of personality, while significant in distinguishing persons from mere things, is abstract and without content, a simple relation of the will to itself. The imperative of right is: "Be a person and respect others as persons" (¶ 36). In this formal conception of right, there is no question of particular interests, advantages, motives or intentions, but only the mere idea of the possibility of choosing based on the having of permission, as long as one does not infringe on the right of other persons. Because of the possibilities of infringement, the positive form of commands in this sphere are prohibitions.

(1) Property (the universality of will as embodied in things)

A person must translate his or her freedom into the external world "in order to exist as Idea" (¶ 41), thus abstract right manifests itself in the absolute right of appropriation over all things. Property is the category through which one becomes an object to oneself in that one actualizes the will through possession of something external. Property is the embodiment of personality and of freedom. Not only can a person put his or her will into something external through the taking possession of it and of using it, but one can also alienate property or yield it to the will of another, including the ability to labor for a restricted period of time. One's personality is inalienable and one's right to personality imprescriptible. This means one cannot alienate all of one's labor time without becoming the property of another.

(2) Contract (the positing of explicit universality of will)

In this sphere, we have a relation of will to will, i.e., one holds property not merely by means of the subjective will externalized in a thing, but by means of another's person's will, and implicitly by virtue of one's participation in a common will. The status of being an independent owner of something from which one excludes the will of another is thus mediated in the identification of one's will with the other in the contractual relation, which presupposes that the contracting parties "recognize each other as persons and property owners" (¶ 71). (Note the significant development here beyond the dialectic of lord and bondsman.) Moreover, when contract involves the alienation or giving up of property, the external thing is now an explicit embodiment of the unity of wills. In contractual relations of exchange, what remains identical as the property of the individuals is its value, in respect to which the parties to the contract are on an equal footing, regardless of the qualitative external differences between the things exchanged. "Value is the universal in which the subjects of the contract participate" (¶ 77).

(3) Wrong (the particular will opposing itself to the universal)

In immediate relations of persons to one another it is possible for a particular will to be at variance with the universal through arbitrariness of decision and contingency of circumstance, and so the appearance (Erscheinung) of right takes on the character of a show (Schein), which is the inessential, arbitrary, posing as the essential. If the "show" is only implicit and not explicit also, i.e., if the wrong passes in the doer's eyes as right, the wrong is non-malicious. In fraud a show is made to deceive the other party and so in the doer's eyes the right asserted is only a show. Crime is wrong both in itself and from the doer's point of view, such that wrong is willed without even the pretense or show of right. Here the form of acting does not imply a recognition of right but rather is an act of coercion through exercise of force. It is a "negatively infinite judgement" in that it asserts a denial of rights to the victim, which is not only incompatible with the fact of the matter but also self-negating in denying its own capacity for rights in principle.

The penalty that falls on the criminal is not merely just but is "a right established within the criminal himself, i.e., in his objectively embodied will, in his action," because the crime as the action of a rational being implies appeal to a universal standard recognized by the criminal (¶ 100). The annulling of crime in this sphere of immediate right occurs first as revenge, which as retributive is just in its content, but in its form it is an act of a subjective will and does not correspond with its universal content and hence as a new transgression is defective and contradictory (¶ 102). All crimes are comparable in their universal property of being injuries, thus, in a sense it is not something personal but the concept itself which carries out retribution.

Crime, as the will which is implicitly null, contains its negation in itself, which is its punishment.

The nullity of crime is that it has set aside right as such, but since right is absolute it cannot be set aside. Thus, the act of crime is not something positive, not a first thing, but is something negative, and punishment is the negation of crime's negation.

b. Morality

The demand for justice as punishment rather than as revenge, with regard to wrong, implies the demand for a will which, though particular and subjective, also wills the universal as such. In wrong the will has become aware of itself as particular and has opposed itself to and contradicted the universal embodied in rights. At this stage the universally right is abstract and one-sided and thus requires a move to a higher level of self-consciousness where the universally right is mediated by the particular convictions of the willing subject. We go beyond the criminal's defiance of the universal by substituting for the abstract conception of personality the more concrete conception of subjectivity. The criminal is now viewed as breaking his own law, and his crime is a self-contradiction and not only a contradiction of a right outside him. This recognition brings us to the level of morality (Moralität) where the will is free both in itself and for itself, i.e., the will is self-conscious of its subjective freedom.

At the level of morality the right of the subjective will is embodied in immediate wills (as opposed to immediate things like property). The defect of this level, however, is that the subject is only for itself, i.e., one is conscious of one's subjectivity and independence but is conscious of universality only as something different from this subjectivity. Therefore, the identity of the particular will and the universal will is only implicit and the moral point of view is that of a relation of "ought-to-be," or the demand for what is right. While the moral will externalizes itself in action, its self-determination is a pure "restlessness" of activity that never arrives at actualization.

The right of the moral will has three aspects. First, there is the right of the will to act in its external environment, to recognize as its actions only those that it has consciously willed in light of an aim or purpose (purpose and responsibility). Second, in my intention I ought to be aware not simply of my particular action but also of the universal which is conjoined with it. The universal is what I have willed and is my intention. The right of intention is that the universal quality of the action is not merely implied but is known by the agent, and so it lies from the start in one's subjective will. Moreover, the content of such a will is not only the right of the particular subject to be satisfied but is elevated to a universal end, the end of welfare or happiness (intention and welfare). The welfare of many unspecified persons is thus also an essential end and right of subjectivity. However, right as an abstract universal and welfare as abstract particularity, may collide, since both are contingent on circumstances for their satisfaction, e.g., in cases where claims of right or welfare by someone may endanger the life of another there can be a counter-claim to a right of distress. "This distress reveals the finitude and therefore the contingency of both right and welfare" (¶ 128). This "contradiction" between right and welfare is overcome in the third aspect of the moral will, the good which is "the Idea as the unity of the concept of the will with the particular will" (¶ 129).

In addition to the right of the subjective will that whatever it recognizes as valid shall be seen by it as good, and that an action shall be imputed to it as good or evil in accordance with its knowledge of the worth which the action has in its external objectivity (¶ 132), which together constitute a "right of insight," the will also must recognize the good as its duty, which is, to begin with, duty for duty's sake, or duty formally and without content (e.g., as expressed in the Kantian "categorical imperative"). Because of this lack of content, the subjective will in its abstract reflection into itself is "absolute inward certainty (Gewißheit) of self," or conscience (Gewissen). While true or authentic conscience is the disposition to will what is absolutely good, and thus correspond with what is objectively right, purely formal conscience lacks an objective system of principles and duties. Although conscience is ideally supposed to mean the identity of subjective knowing and willing with the truly good, when it remains the subjective inner reflection of self-consciousness into itself its claim to this identity is deficient and one-sided. Moreover, when the determinate character of right and duty reduces to subjectivity, the mere inwardness of the will, there is the potentiality of elevating the self-will of particular individuals above the universal itself, i.e., of "slipping into evil" (¶ 139). What makes a person evil is the choosing of natural desires in opposition to the good, i.e., to the concept of the will. When an individual attempts to pass off his or her action as good, and thus imposing it on others, while being aware of the discrepancy between its negative character and the objective universal good, the person falls into hypocrisy. This is one of several forms of perverse moral subjectivity that Hegel discusses at length in his remarks (¶ 140).

c. Ethical Life

Hegel's analysis of the moral implications of "good and conscience" leads to the conclusion that a concrete unity of the objective good with the subjectivity of the will cannot be achieved at the level of personal morality since all attempts at this are problematic. The concrete identity of the good with the subjective will occurs only in moving to the level of ethical life (Sittlichkeit), which Hegel says is "the Idea of freedom…the concept of freedom developed into the existing world and the nature of self-consciousness" (¶ 142). Thus, ethical life is permeated with both objectivity and subjectivity: regarded objectively it is the state and its institutions, whose force (unlike abstract right) depends entirely on the self-consciousness of citizens, on their subjective freedom; regarded subjectively it is the ethical will of the individual which (unlike the moral will) is aware of objective duties that express one's inner sense of universality. The rationality of the ethical order of society is thus constituted in the synthesis of the concept of the will, both as universal and as particular, with its embodiment in institutional life.

The synthesis of ethical life means that individuals not only act in conformity with the ethical good but that they recognize the authority of ethical laws. This authority is not something alien to individuals since they are linked to the ethical order through a strong identification which Hegel says "is more like an identity than even the relation of faith or trust" (¶ 147). The knowledge of how the laws and institutions of society are binding on the will of individuals entails a "doctrine of duties." In duty the individual finds liberation both from dependence on mere natural impulse, which may or may not motivate ethical actions, and from indeterminate subjectivity which cannot produce a clear view of proper action. "In duty the individual acquires his substantive freedom" (¶ 149). In the performance of duty the individual exhibits virtue when the ethical order is reflected in his or her character, and when this is done by simple conformity with one's duties it is rectitude. When individuals are simply identified with the actual ethical order such that their ethical practices are habitual and second nature, ethical life appears in their general mode of conduct as custom (Sitten). Thus, the ethical order manifests its right and validity vis-à-vis individuals. In duty "the self-will of the individual vanishes together with his private conscience which had claimed independence and opposed itself to the ethical substance. For when his character is ethical, he recognizes as the end which moves him to act the universal which is itself unmoved but is disclosed in its specific determinations as rationality actualized. He knows that his own dignity and the whole stability of his particular ends are grounded in this same universal, and it is therein that he actually attains these" (¶ 152). However, this does not deny the right of subjectivity, i.e., the right of individuals to be satisfied in their particular pursuits and free activity; but this right is realized only in belonging to an objective ethical order. The "bond of duty" will be seen as a restriction on the particular individual only if the self-will of subjective freedom is considered in the abstract, apart from an ethical order (as is the case for both Abstract Right and Morality). "Hence, in this identity of the universal will with the particular will, right and duty coalesce, and by being in the ethical order a man has rights in so far as he has duties, and duties in so far as he has rights" (¶ 155).

In the realm of ethical life the logical syllogism of self-determination of the Idea is most clearly applied. The moments of universality, particularity, and individuality initially are represented respectively in the institutions of the family, civil society, and the state. The family is "ethical mind in its natural or immediate phase" and is characterized by love or the feeling of unity in which one is not conscious of oneself as an independent person but only as a member of the family unit to which one is bound. Civil society, on the other hand, comprises an association of individuals considered as self-subsistent and who have no conscious sense of unity of membership but only pursue self-interest, e.g., in satisfying needs, acquiring and protecting property, and in joining organizations for mutual advantage. Finally, the constitution of the political state brings together in a unity the sense of the importance of the whole or universal good along with the freedom of particularity of individual pursuits and thus is "the end and actuality of both the substantial order and the public life devoted thereto" (¶ 157).

i. The Family

The family is characterized by love which is "mind's feeling of its own unity," where one's sense of individuality is within this unity, not as an independent individual but as a member essentially related to the other family members. Thus, familial love implies a contradiction between, on the one hand, not wanting to be a self-subsistent and independent person if that means feeling incomplete and, on the other hand, wanting to be recognized in another person. Familial love is truly an ethical unity, but because it is nonetheless a subjective feeling it is limited in sustaining unity (pars. 158-59, and additions).

(A) Marriage

The union of man and woman in marriage is both natural and spiritual, i.e., is a physical relationship and one that is also self-conscious, and it is entered into on the basis of the free consent of the persons. Since this consent involves bringing two persons into a union, there is the mutual surrender of their natural individuality for the sake of union, which is both a self-restriction and also a liberation because in this way individuals attain a higher self-consciousness.

(B) Family Capital

The family as a unit has its external existence in property, specifically capital (Vermögen) which constitutes permanent and secured possessions that allow for endurance of the family as "person" (¶ 170). This capital is the common property of all the family members, none of whom possess property of their own, but it is administered by the head of the family, the husband.

(C) Education of Children & Dissolution of the Family

Children provide the external and objective basis for the unity of marriage. The love of the parents for their children is the explicit expression of their love for each other, while their immediate feelings of love for each other are only subjective. Children have the right to maintenance and education, and in this regard a claim upon the family capital, but parents have the right to provide this service to the children and to instill discipline over the wishes of their children. The education of children has a twofold purpose: the positive aim of instilling ethical principles in them in the form of immediate feeling and the negative one of raising them out of the instinctive physical level. Marriage can be dissolved not by whim but by duly constituted authority when there is total estrangement of husband and wife. The ethical dissolution of the family results when the children have been educated to be free and responsible persons and they are of mature age under the law. The natural dissolution of the family occurs with the death of the parents, the result of which is the passing of inheritance of property to the surviving family members. The disintegration of the family exhibits its immediacy and contingency as an expression of the ethical Idea (pars. 173-80).

ii. Civil Society

With civil society (bürgerliche Gesellschaft) we move from the family or "the ethical idea still in its concept," where consciousness of the whole or totality is focal, to the "determination of particularity," where the satisfaction of subjective needs and desires is given free reign (pars. 181-182). However, despite the pursuit of private or selfish ends in relatively unrestricted social and economic activity, universality is implicit in the differentiation of particular needs insofar as the welfare of an individual in society is intrinsically bound up with that of others, since each requires another in some way to effectively engage in reciprocal activities like commerce, trade, etc. Because this system of interdependence is not self-conscious but exists only in abstraction from the individual pursuit of need satisfaction, here particularity and universality are only externally related. Hegel says that "this system may be prima facie regarded as the external state, the state based on need, the state as the Understanding (Verstand) envisages it" (¶ 183). However, civil society is also a realm of mediation of particular wills through social interaction and a means whereby individuals are educated (Bildung) through their efforts and struggles toward a higher universal consciousness.

(A) The System of Needs

This dimension of civil society involves the pursuit of need satisfaction. Humans are different from animals in their ability to multiply needs and differentiate them in various ways, which leads to their refinement and luxury. Political economy discovers the necessary interconnections in the social and universalistic side of need. Work is the mode of acquisition and transformation of the means for satisfying needs as well as a mode of practical education in abilities and understanding. Work also reveals the way in which people are dependent upon one another in their self-seeking and how each individual contributes to the need satisfaction of all others. Society generates a "universal permanent capital" (¶ 199) that everyone in principle can draw upon, but the natural inequalities between individuals will translate into social inequalities. Furthermore, labor undergoes a division according to the complexities of the system of production, which is reflected in social class divisions: the agricultural (substantial or immediate); the business (reflecting or formal); and the civil servants (universal). Membership in a class is important for gaining status and recognition in a civil society. Hegel says that "A man actualizes himself only in becoming something definite, i.e., something specifically particularized; this means restricting himself exclusively to one of the particular spheres of need. In this class-system, the ethical frame of mind therefore is rectitude and esprit de corps, i.e., the disposition to make oneself a member of one of the moments of civil society by one's own act … in this way gaining recognition both in one's own eyes and in the eyes of others" (¶ 207).

The "substantial" agricultural class is based upon family relationships whose capital is in the products of nature, such as the land, and tends to be patriarchial, unreflective, and oriented toward dependence rather than free activity. In contrast to this focus on "immediacy," the business class is oriented toward work and reflection, e.g., in transforming raw materials for use and exchange, which is a form of mediation of humans to one another. The main activities of the business class are craftsmanship, manufacture, and trade. The third class is the class of civil servants, which Hegel calls the "universal class" because it has the universal interests of society as its concern. Members of this class are relieved from having to labor to support themselves and maintain their livelihood either from private resources such as inheritance or are paid a salary by the state as members of the bureaucracy. These individuals tend to be highly educated and must qualify for appointment to government positions on the basis of merit.

(B) Administration of Justice

The principle of rightness becomes civil law (Gesetz) when it is posited, and in order to have binding force it must be given determinate objective existence. To be determinately existent, laws must be made universally known through a public legal code. Through a rational legal system, private property and personality are given legal recognition and validity in civil society, and wrongdoing now becomes an infringement, not merely of the subjective right of individuals but also of the larger universal will that exists in ethical life. The court of justice is the means whereby right is vindicated as something universal by addressing particular cases of violation or conflict without mere subjective feeling or private bias. "Instead of the injured party, the injured universal now comes on the scene, and … this pursuit consequently ceases to be the subjective and contingent retribution of revenge and is transformed into the genuine reconciliation of right with itself, i.e, into punishment" (¶ 220). Moreover, court proceedings and legal processes must take place according to rights and rules of evidence; judicial proceedings as well as the laws themselves must be made public; trial should be by jury; and punishment should fit the crime. Finally, in the administration of justice, "civil society returns to its concept, to the unity of the implicit universal with the subjective particular, although here the latter is only that present in single cases and the universality in question is that of abstract right" (¶ 229).

(C) The Police and the Corporation

The Police (Polizei) for Hegel is understood broadly as the public authorities in civil society. In addition to crime fighting organizations, it includes agencies that provide oversight over public utilities as well as regulation of and, when necessary, intervention into activities related to the production, distribution, and sale of goods and services, or with any of the contingencies that can affect the rights and welfare of individuals and society generally (e.g., defense of the public's right not to be defrauded, and also the management of goods inspection). Also, the public authority superintends education and organizes the relief of poverty. Poverty must be addressed both through private charity and public assistance since in civil society it constitutes a social wrong when poverty results in the creation of a class of "penurious rabble" (¶ 245). Society looks to colonization to increase its wealth but poverty remains a problem with no apparent solution.

The corporation (Korporation) applies especially to the business class, since this class is concentrated on the particularities of social existence and the corporation has the function of bringing implicit similarities between various private interests into explicit existence in forms of association. This is not the same as our contemporary business corporation but rather is a voluntary association of persons based on occupational or various social interests (such as professional and trade guilds, educational clubs, religious societies, townships, etc.) Because of the integrating function of the corporation, especially in regard to the social and economic division of labor, what appear as selfish purposes in civil society are shown to be at the same time universal through the formation of concretely recognized commonalities. Hegel says that "a Corporation has the right, under the surveillance of the public authority, (a) to look after its own interests within its own sphere, (b) to co-opt members, qualified objectively by requisite skill and rectitude, to a number fixed by the general structure of society, (c) to protect its members against particular contingencies, (d) to provide the education requisite to fit other to become members. In short, the right is to come on the scene like a second family for its members …" (¶ 252). Furthermore, the family is assured greater stability of livelihood insofar as its providers are corporation members who command the respect due to them in their social positions. "Unless he is a member of an authorized Corporation (and it is only by being authorized that an association becomes a Corporation), an individual is without rank or dignity, his isolation reduces his business to mere self-seeking, and his livelihood and satisfaction become insecure" (¶ 253). Because individual self-seeking is raised to a higher level of common pursuits, albeit restricted to the interest of a sectional group, individual self-consciousness is raised to relative universality. Hence, "As the family was the first, so the Corporation is the second ethical root of the state, the one planted in civil society" (¶ 255).

iii. The State

The political State, as the third moment of Ethical Life, provides a synthesis between the principles governing the Family and those governing Civil Society. The rationality of the state is located in the realization of the universal substantial will in the self-consciousness of particular individuals elevated to consciousness of universality. Freedom becomes explicit and objective in this sphere. "Since the state is mind objectified, it is only as one of its members that the individual has objectivity, genuine individuality, and an ethical life … and the individual's destiny is the living of a universal life" (¶ 258). Rationality is concrete in the state in so far as its content is comprised in the unity of objective freedom (freedom of the universal or substantial will) and subjective freedom (freedom of everyone in knowing and willing of particular ends); and in its form rationality is in self-determining action or laws and principles which are logical universal thoughts (as in the logical syllogism).

The Idea of the State is itself divided into three moments: (a) the immediate actuality of the state as a self-dependent organism, or Constitutional Law; (b) the relation of states to other states in International Law; (c) the universal Idea as Mind or Spirit which gives itself actuality in the process of World-History.

1) Constitutional Law

(1) The Constitution (internally)

Only through the political constitution of the State can universality and particularity be welded together into a real unity. The self-consciousness of this unity is expressed in the recognition on the part of each citizen that the full meaning of one's actual freedom is found in the objective laws and institutions provided by the State. The aspect of identity comes to the fore in the recognition that individual citizens give to the ethical laws such that they "do not live as private persons for their own ends alone, but in the very act of willing these they will the universal in the light of the universal, and their activity is consciously aimed at none but the universal end" (¶ 260). The aspect of differentiation, on the other hand, is found in "the right of individuals to their particular satisfaction," the right of subjective freedom which is maintained in Civil Society. Thus, according to Hegel, "the universal must be furthered, but subjectivity on the other hand must attain its full and living development. It is only when both these moments subsist in their strength that the state can be regarded as articulated and genuinely organized" (¶ 260, addition).

As was indicated in the introduction to the concept of Ethical Life above, the higher authority of the laws and institutions of society requires a doctrine of duties. From the vantage point of the political State, this means that there must be a correlation between rights and duties. "In the state, as something ethical, as the inter-penetration of the substantive and the particular, my obligation to what is substantive is at the same time the embodiment of my particular freedom. This means that in the state duty and right are united in one and the same relation" (¶ 261). In fulfilling one's duties one is also satisfying particular interests, and the conviction that this is so Hegel calls "political sentiment" (politische Gesinnung) or patriotism. "This sentiment is, in general, trust (which may pass over into a greater or lesser degree of educated insight), or the consciousness that my interest, both substantive and particular, is contained and preserved in another's (that is, the state's) interest and end, i.e., in the other's relation to me as an individual" (¶ 268).

Thus, the "bond of duty" cannot involve being coerced into obeying the laws of the State. "Commonplace thinking often has the impression that force holds the state together, but in fact its only bond is the sense of order which everybody possesses" (¶ 268, addition).

According to Hegel, the political state is rational in so far as it inwardly differentiates itself according to the nature of the Concept (Begriff). The principle of the division of powers expresses inner differentiation, but while these powers are distinguished they must also be built into an organic whole such that each contains in itself the other moments so that the political constitution is a concrete unity in difference. Constitutional Law is accordingly divided into three moments: (a) the Legislature which establishes the universal through lawmaking; (b) the Executive which subsumes the particular under the universal through administering the laws; (c) the Crown which is the power of subjectivity of the state in the providing of the act of "ultimate decision" and thus forming into unity the other two powers. Despite the syllogistic sequence of universality, particularity, and individuality in these three constitutional powers, Hegel discusses the Crown first followed by the Executive and the Legislature respectively. Hegel understands the concept of the Crown in terms of constitutional monarchy.

(a) The Crown

"The power of the crown contains in itself the three moments of the whole, namely, (a) the universality of the constitution and the laws; (b) counsel, which refers the particular to the universal; and (g) the moment of ultimate decision, as the self-determination to which everything else reverts and from which everything else derives the beginning of its actuality" (¶ 275). The third moment is what gives expression to the sovereignty of the state, i.e., that the various activities, agencies, functions and powers of the state are not self-subsistent but rather have their basis ultimately in the unity of the state as a single self or self-organized organic whole. The monarch is the bearer of the individuality of the state and its sovereignty is the ideality in unity in which the particular functions and powers of the state subsist. "It is only as a person, the monarch, that the personality of the state is actual. Personality expresses the concept as such; but the person enshrines the actuality of the concept, and only when the concept is determined as a person is it the Idea or truth" (¶ 279).

The monarch is not a despot but rather a constitutional monarch, and he does not act in a capricious manner but is bound by a decision-making process, in particular to the recommendations and decisions of his cabinet (supreme advisory council). The monarch functions solely to give agency to the state, and so his personal traits are irrelevant and his ascending to the throne is based on hereditary succession, and thus on the accident of birth. "In a completely organized state, it is only a question of the culminating point of formal decision … he has only to say 'yes' and dot the 'i' …. In a well organized monarchy, the objective aspect belongs to law alone, and the monarch's part is merely to set to the law the subjective 'I will'" (¶ 280, addition). The "majesty of the monarch" lies in the free asserting of 'I will' as an expression of the unity of the state and the final step in establishing law.

(b) The Executive

The executive has the task of executing and applying the decisions formally made by the monarch. "This task of merely subsuming the particular under the universal is comprised in the executive power, which also includes the powers of the judiciary and the police" (¶ 287). Also, the executive is the higher authority that oversees the filling of positions of responsibilities in corporations. The executive is comprised of the civil servants proper and the higher advisory officials organized into committees, both of which are connected to the monarch through their supreme departmental heads. Overall, government has its division of labor into various centers of administration managed by special officials. Individuals are appointed to executive functions on the basis of their knowledgibility and proof of ability and tenure is conditional on the fulfillment of duties, with the offices in the civil service being open to all citizens.

The executive is not an unchecked bureaucratic authority. "The security of the state and its subjects against the misuse of power by ministers and their officials lies directly in their hierarchical organization and their answerability; but it lies too in the authority given to societies and corporations …" (¶ 295). However, civil servants will tend to be dispassionate, upright, and polite in part as "a result of direct education in thought and ethical conduct" (¶ 296). Civil servants and the members of the executive make up the largest section of the middle class, the class with a highly developed intelligence and consciousness of right. Moreover, "The sovereign working on the middle class at the top, and Corporation-rights working on it at the bottom, are the institutions which effectively prevent it from acquiring the isolated position of an aristocracy and using its education and skill as a means to an arbitrary tyranny" (¶ 297).

(c) The Legislature

For Hegel, "The legislature is concerned (a) with the laws as such in so far as they require fresh and extended determination; and (b) with the content of home affairs affecting the entire state" (¶ 298). Legislative activity focuses on both providing well-being and happiness for citizens as well as exacting services from them (largely in the form of monetary taxes). The proper function of legislation is distinguished from the function of administration and state regulation in that the content of the former are determinate laws that are wholly universal whereas in administration it is application of the law to particulars, along with enforcing the law. Hegel also says that the other two moments of the political constitution, the monarchy and the executive, are the first two moments of the legislature, i.e., are reflected in the legislature respectively through the ultimate decision regarding proposed laws and an advising function in their formation. Hegel rejects the idea of independence or separation of powers for the sake of checks and balances, which he holds destroys the unity of the state (¶ 300, addition). The third moment in the legislature is the estates (Stände), which are the classes of society given political recognition in the legislature.

In the legislature, the estates "have the function of bringing public affairs into existence not only implicitly, but also actually, i.e., of bringing into existence the moment of subjective formal freedom, the public consciousness as an empirical universal, of which the thoughts and opinions of the Many are particulars" (¶ 301). Not only do the estates guarantee the general welfare and public freedom, but they are also the means by which the state as a whole enters the subjective consciousness of the people through their participation in the state. Thus, the estates incorporate the private judgment and will of individuals in civil society and give it political significance.

The estates have an important integrating function in the state overall. "Regarded as a mediating organ, the Estates stand between the government in general on the one hand, and the nation broken up into particulars (people and associations) on the other. … [I]n common with the organized executive, they are a middle term preventing both the extreme isolation of the power of the crown … and also the isolation of the particular interests of persons, societies and Corporations" (¶ 302). Also, the organizing function of the estates prevents groups in society from becoming formless masses that could form anti-government feelings and rise up in blocs in opposition to the state.

The three classes of civil society, the agricultural, the business, and the universal class of civil servants, are each given political voice in the Estates Assembly in accordance with their distinctiveness in the lower spheres of civil life. The legislature is divided into two houses, an upper and lower. The upper house comprises the agricultural estate (including the peasant farmers and landed aristocracy), a class "whose ethical life is natural, whose basis is family life, and, so far as its livelihood is concerned, the possession of land. Its particular members attain their position by birth, just as the monarch does, and, in common with him, they possess a will which rests on itself alone" (¶ 305). Landed gentry inherit their estates and so owe their position to birth (primogeniture) and thus are free from the exigencies and uncertainties of the life of business and state interference. The relative independence of this class makes it particularly suited for public office as well as a mediating element between the crown and civil society.

The second section of the estates, the business class, comprises the "fluctuating and changeable element in civil society" which can enter politics only through its deputies or representatives (unlike the agricultural estate from which members can present themselves to the Estates Assembly in person). The appointment of deputies is "made by society as a society" both because of the multiplicity of members but also because representation must reflect the organization of civil society into associations, communities, and corporations. It is only as a member of such groups that an individual is a member of the state, and hence rational representation implies that consent to legislation is to be given not directly by all but only by "plenipotentiaries" who are chosen on the basis of their understanding of public affairs as well as managerial and political acumen, character, insight, etc. Moreover, their charge is to further the general interest of society and not the interest of a particular association or corporation instead (¶ 308-10).

The deputies of civil society are selected by the various corporations, not on the basis of universal direct suffrage which Hegel believed inevitably leads to electoral indifference, and they adopt the point of view of society. "Deputies are sometimes regarded as 'representatives'; but they are representatives in an organic, rational sense only if they are representatives not of individuals or a conglomeration of them, but of one of the essential spheres of society and its large-scale interests. Hence, representation cannot now be taken to mean simply the substitution of one man for another; the point is that the interest itself is actually present in its representative, while he himself is there to represent the objective element of his own being" (¶ 311).

The debates that take place in the Estates Assembly are to be open to the public, whereby citizens can become politically educated both about national affairs and the true character of their own interests. "The formal subjective freedom of individuals consists in their having and expressing their own private judgements, opinions, and recommendations as affairs of state. This freedom is collectively manifested as what is called 'public opinion', in which what is absolutely universal, the substantive and the true, is linked with its opposite, the purely particular and private opinions of the Many" (¶ 316). Public opinion is a "standing self-contradiction" because, on the one hand, it gives expression to genuine needs and proper tendencies of common life along with common sense views about important matters and, on the other, is infected with accidental opinion, ignorance, and faulty judgment. "Public opinion therefore deserves to be as much respected as despised -- despised for its concrete expression and for the concrete consciousness it expresses, respected for its essential basis, a basis which only glimmers more or less dimly in that concrete expression" (¶ 318). Moreover, while there is freedom of public communication, freedom of the press is not totally unrestricted as freedom does not mean absence of all restriction, either in word or deed.

Hegel calls the class of civil servants the "universal class" not only because as members of the executive their function is to "subsume the particular under the universal" in the administration of law, but also because they reflect a disposition of mind (due perhaps largely from their education) that transcends concerns with selfish ends in the devotion to the discharge of public functions and to the public universal good. As one of the classes of the estates, civil servants also participate in the legislature as an "unofficial class," which seems to mean that as members of the executive they will attend legislative assemblies in an advisory capacity, but this is not entirely clear from Hegel's text. Also, given that the monarch and the classes of civil society when conceived in abstraction are opposed to each other as "the one and the many," they must become "fused into a unity" or mediated together through the civil servant class. From the point of view of the crown the executive is such a middle term, because it carries out the final decisions of the crown and makes it "particularized" in civil society. On the other hand, in order for the classes of civil society to actually sense this unity with the crown a mediation must occur from the other direction, so to speak, where the upper house of the estates, in virtue of certain likenesses to the Crown (e.g., role of birth for one's position) is able to mediate between the Crown and civil society as a whole.

(2) Sovereignty vis-à-vis foreign States

The interpenetration of the universal with the particular will through a complex system of social and political mediations is what produces the self-consciousness of the nation-state considered as an organic (internally differentiated and interrelated) totality or concrete individual. In this system, particular individuals consciously pursue the universal ends of the State, not out of external or mechanical conformity to law, but in the free development of personal individuality and the expression of the unique subjectivity of each. However, individuality is not something possessed by particular persons alone, or even primarily by such persons. The state as a whole, i.e., the nation-state as distinct from the political state as one of its moments, constitutes a higher form of individuality. In principle, Mind or Spirit possesses a singleness in its "negative self-relation," i.e., in the sense that unity in a being is a function of setting itself off from other beings. "Individuality is awareness of one's existence as a unit in sharp distinction from others. It manifests itself here in the state as a relation to other states, each of which is autonomous vis-à-vis the others. This autonomy embodies mind's actual awareness of itself as a unit and hence it is the most fundamental freedom which a people possesses as well as its highest dignity" (¶ 322). For any being to have self-conscious independence requires distinguishing the self from any of its contingent characteristics (inner self-negation), which externally is a distinction from another being. This consciousness of what one is not is for the nation-state its negative relation to itself embodied externally in the world as the relation of one state to another. However, this is not a mere externality, "But in fact this negative relation is that moment in the state which is most supremely its own, the state's actual infinity as the ideality of everything finite within it" (¶ 323).

According to Hegel, war is an "ethical moment" in the life of a nation-state and hence is neither purely accidental nor an inherent evil. Because there is no higher earthly power ruling over nation-states, and because these entities are oriented to preserving their existence and sovereignty, conflicts leading to war are inevitable. Also, defense of one's nation is an ethical duty and the ultimate test of one's patriotism is war. "Sacrifice on behalf of the individuality of the state is the substantial tie between the state and all its members and so is a universal duty" (¶ 325). In making a sacrifice for the sake of the state individuals prove their courage, which involves a transcendence of concern with egoistic interests and mere material existence. "The intrinsic worth of courage as a disposition of mind is to be found in the genuine absolute, final end, the sovereignty of the state. The work of courage is to actualize this final end, and the means to this end is the sacrifice of personal actuality" (¶ 328). Moreover, war, along with catastrophy, disease, etc, highlights the finitude, insecurity, and ultimate transitoriness of human existence and puts the health of a state to a test. Hegel does not consider the ideal of "perpetual peace," as advocated by Kant, a realistic goal towards which humanity can strive. Not only is the sovereignty of each state imprescriptible, but any alliance or league of states will be established in opposition to others.

2) International Law

"International law springs from the relations between autonomous states. It is for this reason that what is absolute in it retains the form of an ought-to-be, since its actuality depends on different wills each of which is sovereign" (¶ 330). States are not private persons in civil society who pursue their self-interest in the context of universal interdependence but rather are completely autonomous entities with no relations of private right or morality. However, since a state cannot escape having relations with other states, there must be at least some sort of recognition of each by the other. International law prescribes that treaties between states ought to be kept, but this universal proviso remains abstract because the sovereignty of a state is its guiding principle, hence states are to that extent in a state of nature in relation to each other (in the Hobbesian sense of there being natural rights to one's survival with no natural duties to others). "Their rights are actualized only in their particular wills and not in a universal will with constitutional powers over them. This universal proviso of international law therefore does not go beyond an ought-to-be, and what really happens is that international relations in accordance with treaty alternate with the severance of these relations" (¶ 333). Obviously, if states come to disagree about the nature of their treaties, etc., and there is no acceptable compromise for each party, then matters will ultimately be settled by war.

States recognize their own welfare as the highest law governing their relations to one another, however, the claim by a state to recognition of this welfare is quite different from claims to welfare by individual person in civil society. "The ethical substance, the state, has its determinate being, i.e., its right, directly embodied in something existent … and the principle of its conduct and behavior can only be this concrete existent and not one of many universal thoughts supposed to be moral commands" (¶ 337). States recognize each other as states, and even in war there is awareness of the possibility that peace can be restored and that therefore war ought to come to an end, as well as understandings about the proper limitations on the waging of war. However, at most this translates into the jus gentium, the law of nations understood as customary relationships, which remains a "maelstrom of external contingency." The principles of the mind or spirit (Volksgeist) of a nation-state are wholly restricted because its particularity is already that of realized individuality, possessing objective actuality and self-consciousness. Hence, the reciprocal relations of states to one another partake of a "dialectic of finitude" out of which arises the universal mind, "the mind of the world, free from all restriction, producing itself as that which exercises its right–and its right is the highest right of all–over these finite minds in the 'history of the world which is the world's court of judgment'" (¶ 340).

3) World History

To say that history is the world's court of judgment is to say that over and above the nation-states, or national "spirits," there is the mind or Spirit of the world (Weltgeist) which pronounces its verdict through the development of history itself. The verdicts of world history, however, are not expressions of mere might, which in itself is abstract and non-rational. Rather than blind destiny, "world history is the necessary development, out of the concepts of mind's freedom alone, of the moments of reason and so of the self-consciousness and freedom of mind" (¶ 342). The history of Spirit is the development through time of its own self-consciousness through the actions of peoples, states, and world historical actors who, while absorbed in their own interests, are nonetheless the unconscious instruments of the work of Spirit. "All actions, including world-historical actions, culminate with individuals as subjects giving actuality to the substantial. They are the living instruments of what is in substance the deed of the world mind and they are therefore directly at one with that deed though it is concealed from them and is not their aim and object" (¶ 348). The actions of great men are produced through their subjective willing and their passion, but the substance of these deeds is actually the accomplishment not of the individual agent but of the World Spirit (e.g., the founding of states by world-historical heroes).

Hegel says that in the history of the world we can distinguish several important formations of the self-consciousness of Spirit in the course of its free self-development, each corresponding to a significant principle. More specifically, there are four world-historical epochs, each manifesting a principle of Spirit as expressed through a dominant culture. In the Philosophy of Right, Hegel discusses these in a very abbreviated way in paragraphs 253-260, which brings this work to an end. Here we will draw from the more elaborated treatment in the appendix to the introduction to Hegel's lectures on the Philosophy of World History.

(1) The Oriental Realm (mind in its immediate substance)

Here Spirit exists in its substantiality (objectivity) without inward differentiation. Individuals have no self-consciousness of personality or of rights–they are still immersed in external nature (and their divinities are naturalistic as well). Hegel characterizes this stage as one of consciousness in its immediacy, where subjectivity and substantiality are unmediated. In his Philosophy of History Hegel discusses China, India, and Persia specifically and suggests that these cultures do not actually have a history but rather are subject to natural cyclical processes. The typical governments of these cultures are theocratic and more particularly despotism, aristocracy, and monarchy respectively. Persia and Egypt are seen as transitional from these "unhistorical" and "non-political" states. Hegel calls this period the "childhood" of Spirit.

(2) The Greek Realm (mind in the simple unity of subjective and objective)

In this realm, we have the mixing of subjective freedom and substantiality in the ethical life of the Greek polis, because the ancient Greek city-states give expression to personal individuality for those who are free and have status. However, the relation of individual to the state is not self-conscious but is unreflective and based on obedience to custom and tradition. Hence, the immediate union of subjectivity with the substantial mind is unstable and leads to fragmentation. This is the period of the "adolescence" of Spirit.

(3) The Roman Realm (mind in its abstract universality)

At this stage, individual personality is recognized in formal rights, thus including a level of reflection absent in the Greek realm of "beautiful freedom." Here freedom is difficult because the universal subjugates individuals, i.e., the state becomes an abstraction over above its citizens who must be sacrificed to the severe demands of a state in which individuals form a homogeneous mass. A tension between the two principles of individuality and universality ensues, manifesting itself in the formation of political despotism and insurgency against it. This realm gives expression to the "manhood" of Spirit.

(4) The Germanic Realm (reconciled unity of subjective and objective mind)

This realm comprises along with Germany and the Nordic peoples the major European nations (France, Italy, Spain) along with England. The principle of subjective freedom comes to the fore in such a way as to be made explicit in the life of Spirit and also mediated with substantiality. This involves a gradual development that begins with the rise of Christianity and its spiritual reconciliation of inner and outer life and culminates in the appearance of the modern nation-state, the rational Idea of which is articulated in the Philosophy of Right. (Along the way there are several milestones Hegel discusses in his Philosophy of History that are especially important in the developing of the self-consciousness of freedom, in particular the Reformation, the Enlightenment, and the French Revolution.) One of the significant features of the modern world is the overcoming of the antithesis of church and state that developed in the Medieval period. This final stage of Spirit is mature "old age."

In sum, for Hegel the modern nation-state can be said to manifest a "personality" and a self-consciousness of its inherent nature and goals, indeed a self-awareness of everything which is implicit in its concept, and is able to act rationally and in accordance with its self-awareness. The modern nation-state is a "spiritual individual," the true historical individual, precisely because of the level of realization of self-consciousness that it actualizes. The development of the perfected nation-state is the end or goal of history because it provides an optimal level of realization of self-consciousness, a more comprehensive level of realization of freedom than mere natural individuals, or other forms of human organization, can produce.

7. Closing Remarks

In closing this account of Hegel's theory of the state, a few words on a "theory and practice" problem of the modern state. In the preface to the Philosophy of Right Hegel is quite clear that his science of the state articulates the nature of the state, not as it ought to be, but as it really is, as something inherently rational. Hegel's famous quote in this regard is "What is rational is actual and what is actual is rational," where by the 'actual' (Wirklich) Hegel means not the merely existent, i.e., a state that can be simply identified empirically, but the actualized or realized state, i.e., one that corresponds to its rational concept and thus in some sense must be perfected. Later in the introduction of the Idea of the state in paragraph 258, Hegel is at pains to distinguish the Idea of the state from a state understood in terms of its historical origins and says that while the state is the way of God in the world we must not focus on particular states or on particular institutions of the state, but only on the Idea itself. Furthermore he says, "The state is no ideal work of art; it stands on earth and so in the sphere of caprice, chance, and error, and bad behavior may disfigure it in many respects. But the ugliest of men, or a criminal, or an invalid, or a cripple, is still always a living man. The affirmative, life, subsists despite his defects, and it is this affirmative factor which is our theme here" (¶ 258, addition). The issue, then, is whether the actual state -- the subject of philosophical science -- is only a theoretical possibility and whether from a practical point of view all existing states are in some way disfigured or deficient. Our ability to rationally distill from existing states their ideal characteristics does not entail that a fully actualized state does, or will, exist. Hence, there is perhaps some ambiguity in Hegel's claim about the modern state as an actualization of freedom.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Hegel in German and in English Translation

Below are works by Hegel that relate most directly to his social and political philosophy.

  • Encyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften im Grundrisse, Berlin 1830; ed. G. Lasson & O. Pöggler (Hamburg, 1959).
    • In the third volume of this work, The Philosophy of Spirit, the section on Objective Spirit corresponds to Hegel's Philosophy of Right.
  • Grundlinien der Philosophie des Rechts, ed. J. Hoffmeister. Hamburg, 1955.
  • Hegels Grundlinien der Philosophie des Rechts, 2nd edn. hrsg. G. Lasson. Leipzig, 1921.
    • This is the most recent edition referred to in T. M. Knox's translation of 1952.
  • Hegel's Logic, trans. William Wallace. Oxford University Press, 1892.
  • Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. A.V. Miller. Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Hegel's Philosophy of Mind, trans. William Wallace & A. V. Miller. Oxford University Press, 1971.
  • Hegel's Philosophy of Right, trans. T. M. Knox. Clarendon Press, 1952; Oxford University Press, 1967.
  • Hegel's Political Writings, trans. T. M. Knox, with an introductory essay by Z. A. Pelczynski. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1964.
    • This contains the following pieces: "The German Constitution," "On the Recent Domestic Affairs of Wurtemberg …," "The Proceedings of the Estates Assembly in the Kingdom of Wurtemberg, 1815-1816," and "The English Reform Bill."
  • Hegels sämtliche Werke, vol. VIII, ed. E. Gans. Berlin: 1833, 1st ed.; 1854, 2nd ed..
    • These were the first editions of the material of The Philosophy of Right to incorporate additions culled from notes taken at Hegel's lectures. T. M. Knox reproduces these in his 1952 translation.
  • Jenaer Realphilosophie I: Die Vorlesungen von 1803/4, ed. J. Hoffmeister. Leipzig, 1913.
  • Jenaer Realphilosophie II: Die Vorlesungen von 1805/6, ed. J. Hoffmeister. Hamburg, 1967.
  • Lectures on the Philosophy of World History: Introduction, trans. H. B. Nisbet, with an introduction by Duncan Forbes. Cambridge University Press, 1975.
    • This is based on the 1955 German edition by J. Hoffmeister.
  • Natural Law, trans. T. M. Knox, with an introduction by H. B. Acton. Philadelphia, PA: University of Pennsylvania Press, 1977.
  • Phänomenologie des Geistes, ed. J. Hoffmeister. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1952.
  • The Philosophy of History, trans. J. B. Sibree. New York: Dover Publications Inc., 1956.
    • This is a reprint of the 1899 translation (the first was done in 1857) of Hegel's Lectures on the Philosophy of History, published by Colonial House Press. The Dover edition has a new introduction by C. J. Friedrich.
  • Political Writings. Eds. L. Dickie & H. B. Nisbet. Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
  • Politische Schriften, Nachwort von Jürgen Habermas. Frankfurt/Main, 1966. A more recent edition of the material of the Schriften zur Politik (see below).
  • Reason in History, trans. R. S. Hartman. New York, 1953. The introduction to Hegel's lectures on the Philosophy of World History.
  • Schriften zur Politik und Rechtsphilosophie, 2nd ed. hrsg. Georg Lasson. Leipzig, 1923. This is the basis of T. M. Knox's translations in Hegel's Political Writings, 1964.
  • System of Ethical Life and First Philosophy of Spirit, trans. H. S. Harris & T. M. Knox. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1979.
  • Die Vernunft in der Geschichte, ed. J. Hoffmeister. Hamburg, 1955.
    • This is the fourth edition of Hegel's lectures on the Philosophy of World History given in Berlin from 1822-1830; the previous editions were done by Eduard Gans (1837), Karl Hegel (1840), and Georg Lasson (1917, 1920, 1930). In the 1930 edition, Lasson added additional manuscript material by Hegel as well as lecture notes from students, which are preserved in Hoffmeister's edition.
  • Werke. Frankfurt: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1970.
    • This is the most recent and comprehensive collection of Hegel's works. His social and political writings are contained in various volumes.

b. Works on Hegel's Social and Political Philosophy

The books listed below either focus on one or more aspects of Hegel's social and political thought or include some discussion in this area and, moreover, are significant enough works on Hegel to be included. The most comprehensive bibliography on Hegel is Hegel-Bibliographie (München: K. G Saur Verlag, 1980). For books and articles in the last 25 years, consult the Philosopher's Index.

  • Avineri, Shlomo. Hegel's Theory of the Modern State. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1972.
  • Bosanquet, Bernard. The Philosophical Theory of the State. 4th edition, London: Macmillan, 1930, 1951.
  • Cullen, Bernard. Hegel's Social and Political Thought: An Introduction. New York: St. Martin's Press, 1979.
  • Findlay, John. Hegel: A Re-examination (1958). Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1976.
  • Foster, Michael B. The Political Philosophies of Plato and Hegel. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1935/1968.
  • Dickey, Laurence. Religion, Economics, and the Politics of Spirit. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
  • Franco, Paul. Hegel's Philosophy of Freedom. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2000.
  • Gray, Jesse Glen. Hegel And Greek Thought. New York: Harper & Row, 1968.
  • Hardimon, Michael O. Hegel's Social Philosophy: The Project of Reconciliation. Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Harris, H. S. Hegel's Development, vols. 1 & 2. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1972, 1983.
  • Haym, Rudolf. Hegel und seine Zeit. Berlin, 1857; Hildenshine, 1962).
  • Henrich, Dieter & R. P. Horstman. Hegels Philosophie des Rechts. Stuttgart: Klett-Catta, 1982.
  • Hicks, Steven V. International Law and the Possibility of a Just World Order: An Essay on Hegel's Universalism. Value Inquiry Book Series 78. Amsterdam/Atlanta, GA: Rodopi, 1999.
  • Hyppolite, Jean. Genesis and Structure of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit (1946). Trans. S. Cherniak & J. Heckman. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1974.
  • Kainz, Howard P. Hegel's Philosophy of Right with Marx's Commentary. The Hague: Nijhoff, 1974.
  • Kaufman, Walter A. Hegel's Political Philosophy. New York: Atherton Press, 1970.
  • ________. Hegel: A Reinterpretation. New York: Anchor Books, 1966.
  • Kelly, George Armstrong. Hegel's Retreat From Eleusis: Studies In Political Thought. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1978.
  • Kojeve, Alexander. Introduction to the Reading of Hegel (1947). Ed. Allen Bloom, trans. J. H. Nichols. New York: Basic Books, 1969.
  • Lakeland, Paul. The Politics of Salvation: The Hegelian Idea of the State. Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1984.
  • MacGregor, David. The Communist Ideal in Hegel and Marx. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1984.
  • ___________. Hegel, Marx, and the English State. University of Toronto Press, 1996.
  • Marcuse, Herbert. Reason and Revolution: Hegel and the Rise of Social Theory. Boston: Beacon Press, 1960.
  • Mehta, V.R. Hegel and the Modern State. New Delhi: Associated Publishing House, 1968.
  • Mitias, Michael. Moral Foundation of the State in Hegel's Philosophy of Right. Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1984.
  • Morris, George S. Hegel's Philosophy of the State and of History. Chicago: S. C. Griggs & Co., 18871, 18922.
  • O'Brien, George Dennis. Hegel On Reason and History. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1975.
  • O'Neil, John, ed. Hegel's Dialectic of Desire and Recognition: Texts and Commentary. Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1996.
  • Paolucci, Henry. The Political Thought of G. W. F. Hegel. Whitestone, NY: Griffon House, 1978.
  • Pelczynski, Z. A. (ed.). Hegel's Political Philosophy: Problems and Perspectives. London: Cambridge University Press, 1971.
  • ___________. The State and Civil Society: Studies in Hegel's Political Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Perkins, Robert L. (ed.). History and System: Hegel's Philosophy of History. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1984.
  • Plamenatz, John. Man and Society, vol. II. London: Longman, 1963.
  • Plant, Raymond. Hegel: An Introduction. London: Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1972; Basil Blackwell, 1983.
  • Pepperzak, Adriaan T. Philosophy and Politics: A Commentary to the Preface of Hegel's Philosophy of Right. Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff Publishers, 1987.
  • Popper, Karl. The Open Society and Its Enemies. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1966.
  • Reyburn, Hugh A. The Ethical Theory of Hegel: A Study of the Philosophy of Right. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1921.
  • Riedel, Manfred. Between Tradition and Revolution: The Hegelian Transformation of Political Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Ritter, Joachim. Hegel and the French Revolution: Essays on ‘The Philosophy of Right'. trans. Richard Dien Winfield, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 1982.
  • Rosenkranz, Karl. Hegel As The National Philosopher of Germany. trans. G. S. Hall, St. Louis: Gray, Baker, 1874.
  • Rosenweig, Franz. Hegel und der Staat. Berlin/München, 1920; Aalen: Scientia Verlag, 1982.
  • Shanks, Andrew. Hegel's Political Theology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Shklar, Judith N. Freedom and Independence: A Study of the Political Ideas of Hegel's ‘Phenomenology of Mind'. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1976.
  • Siebert, Rudolf J. Hegel's Concept of Marriage and Family: The Origin of Subjective Freedom. Washington, D.C.: The University Press of America, 1979.
  • _______. Hegel's Philosophy of History: Theological, Humanistic and Scientific Elements. Washington: University Press of America, 1979.
  • Siep, Ludwig. Anerkennung als Prinzip der praktische Philosophie: Zur Hegels Jenaer Philosophie des Geistes. München, Alber, 1979
  • Singer, Peter. Hegel. Past Masters Series (Oxford University Press, 1983).
  • Smith, Steven B. Hegel's Critique of Liberalism: Rights in Context. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1989.
  • Steinberger, Peter J. Logic and Politics: Hegel's Philosophy of Right. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1982.
  • Stepelevich, L. S. & D. Lamb, (eds.). Hegel's Philosophy of Action. Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press, 1983.
  • Taylor, Charles. Hegel and Modern Society. New York and London: Cambridge University Press, 1979.
  • Tunick, Mark. Hegel's Political Philosophy. Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Verene, Donald Phillip (ed.). Hegel's Social and Political Thought: The Philosophy of Objective Spirit. Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press/Sussex: Harvester Press, 1980.
  • Walsh, William Henry. Hegelian Ethics. London/Melbourne: Macmillan; New York: St. Martin's Press, 1969.
  • Wazek, Norbert. The Scottish Enlightenment and Hegel's Account of 'Civil Society'. Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1988.
  • Weil, Eric. Hegel et L'Etat. Paris, 1950.
  • Westphal, Merold. History and Truth in Hegel's Phenomenology. Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press, 1979.
  • Wilkins, Burleigh Taylor. Hegel's Philosophy of History. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1974.
  • Williams, Robert R. (ed.). Beyond Liberalism and Communitarianism: Studies in Hegel's Philosophy of Right. Proceedings of the 15th Biennial Meeting of the Hegel Society of America. SUNY Press, 2000.
  • Wood, Allen. Hegel's Ethical Thought. Cambridge University Press, 1982.

Author Information

David A. Duquette
St. Norbert College
U. S. A.

Kierkegaard, Søren

Søren Kierkegaard (1813-1855)

KierkegaardSøren Kierkegaard is an outsider in the history of philosophy. His peculiar authorship comprises a baffling array of different narrative points of view and disciplinary subject matter, including aesthetic novels, works of psychology and Christian dogmatics, satirical prefaces, philosophical "scraps" and "postscripts," literary reviews, edifying discourses, Christian polemics, and retrospective self-interpretations. His arsenal of rhetoric includes irony, satire, parody, humor, polemic and a dialectical method of "indirect communication" - all designed to deepen the reader’s subjective passionate engagement with ultimate existential issues. Like his role models Socrates and Christ, Kierkegaard takes how one lives one’s life to be the prime criterion of being in the truth. Kierkegaard’s closest literary and philosophical models are Plato, J.G. Hamann, G.E. Lessing, and his teacher of philosophy at the University of Copenhagen Poul Martin Møller, although Goethe, the German Romantics, Hegel, Kant and the logic of Adolf Trendelenburg are also important influences. His prime theological influence is Martin Luther, although his reactions to his Danish contemporaries N.F.S. Grundtvig and H.L. Martensen are also crucial. In addition to being dubbed "the father of existentialism," Kierkegaard is best known as a trenchant critic of Hegel and Hegelianism and for his invention or elaboration of a host of philosophical, psychological, literary and theological categories, including: anxiety, despair, melancholy, repetition, inwardness, irony, existential stages, inherited sin, teleological suspension of the ethical, Christian paradox, the absurd, reduplication, universal/exception, sacrifice, love as a duty, seduction, the demonic, and indirect communication.

Table of Contents

  1. Life (1813-55)
    1. Father and Son: Inherited Melancholy
    2. Regina Olsen: The Sacrifice of Love
    3. The Master of Irony and the Seductions of Writing
    4. The "Authorship": From Melancholy to Humor
    5. The "Second Authorship": Self-Sacrifice, Love, Despair, and the God-Man
    6. The Attack on the Danish People's Church
  2. The "Aesthetic Authorship"
    1. On the Concept of Irony and Either/Or
    2. Fear and Trembling and Repetition
    3. Philosophical Fragments, The Concept of Anxiety, and Prefaces
    4. Stages on Life’s Way and Concluding Unscientific Postscript
  3. The Edifying Discourses
    1. Sermons, Deliberations, and Edifying Discourses
    2. Direct and Indirect Communication
    3. That Single Individual, My Reader
  4. The "Second Authorship"
    1. Works of Love
    2. Anti-Climacus
    3. The Attack on the Church
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life (1813-55)

a. Father and Son: Inherited Melancholy

Søren Aabye Kierkegaard was born on May 5th 1813 in Copenhagen. He was the seventh and last child of wealthy hosier, Michael Pedersen Kierkegaard and Ane Sørensdatter Lund, a former household servant and distant cousin of Michael Kierkegaard. This was Michael Kierkegaard's second marriage, which came within a year of his first wife’s death and four months into Ane Lund’s first pregnancy. Michael Kierkegaard was a deeply melancholic man, sternly religious and carried a heavy burden of guilt, which he imposed on his children. Søren Kierkegaard often lamented that he had never had a childhood of carefree spontaneity, but that he had been "born old." As a starving shepherd boy on the Jutland heath Michael had cursed God. His surname derived from the fact that his family was indentured to the parish priest, who provided a piece of the church (Kirke) farm (Gaard) for the family’s use. The name Kirkegaard (in older spelling Kierkegaard) more commonly means 'churchyard’ or ‘cemetery.’ A sense of doom and death seemed to hover over Michael Kierkegaard for most of his 82 years. Although his material fortunes soon turned around dramatically, he was convinced that he had brought a curse on his family and that all his children were doomed to die by the age attained by Jesus Christ (33). Of Michael’s seven children, only Peter Christian and Søren Aabye survived beyond this age.

At age 12 Michael Kierkegaard was summoned to Copenhagen to work for his uncle as a journeyman in the cloth trade. Michael turned out to be an astute businessman and by the age of 24 had his own flourishing business. He subsequently inherited his uncle's fortune, and augmented his wealth by some felicitous investments during the state bankruptcy of 1813 (the year, as Søren later put it, in which so many bad notes were put into circulation). Michael retired young and devoted himself to the study of theology, philosophy and literature. He bequeathed to his surviving sons Peter and Søren not only material wealth, but also supremely sharp intellect, a fathomless sense of guilt, and a relentless burden of melancholy. Although his father was wealthy, Søren was brought up rather stringently. He stood out at school because of his plain, unfashionable apparel and spindly stature. He learned to avoid teasing only by honing a caustic wit and a canny appreciation of other people's psychological weaknesses. He was sent to one of Copenhagen’s best schools, The School of Civic Virtue [Borgerdydskolen], to receive a classical education. More than twice as much time was devoted to Latin in this school than to any other subject. Søren distinguished himself academically at school, especially in Latin and history, though according to his classmates he struggled with Danish composition. This became a real problem later, when he tried desperately to break into the Danish literary scene as a writer. His early publications were characterized by complex Germanic constructions and excessive use of Latin phrases. But eventually he became a master of his mother tongue, one of the two great stylists of Danish in his time, together with Hans Christian Andersen. Kierkegaard's father is a constant presence in his authorship. He appears in stories of sacrifice, of inherited melancholy and guilt, as the archetypal patriarch, and even in explicit dedications at the beginning of several edifying discourses. Kierkegaard’s mother, on the other hand, never gets a mention in any of the writings - not even in his journal on the day of her death. His mother-tongue, though, is omnipresent. If we conjoin this fact with the remark in Concluding Unscientific Postscript (1846) that "... an omnipresent person should be recognizable precisely by being invisible," we could speculate that the mother is even more present than the father, pervading all but the foreign language insertions in the texts. But whether or not there is any substance in this speculation, the invisibility of the mother and the treatment of women in general are indicative of Kierkegaard’s uneasy relationship with the opposite sex.

b. Regina Olsen: The Sacrifice of Love

Søren drifted into the study of theology at the University of Copenhagen, but soon broadened his study to include philosophy and literature. He started rather desultorily, and enjoyed a relatively dissolute time, even aspiring to cut the figure of a dandy. He ran up debts, which his father reluctantly paid, but eventually knuckled down to finish his degree when his father died in 1838. It seemed he was destined for a life as a pastor in the Danish People's Church. In 1840, just before he enrolled at the Pastoral Seminary, he became engaged to Regina Olsen. This engagement was to form the basis of a great literary love story, propagated by Kierkegaard through his published writings and his journals. It also provided an occasion for Kierkegaard to define himself further as an outsider. For several years (at least since 1835) Kierkegaard had been dabbling with the idea of becoming a writer. The wealth he had inherited from his father enabled him to support himself comfortably without the need to work for a living. But it was not really enough to support a wife, let alone a wife and children. Furthermore, Kierkegaard harbored an undisclosed secret, something dark and personal, which he thought it his duty to confide to a wife, but which he dared not. Whether it was some sexual indiscretion, an inherited sexual disease, his innate melancholy, an egotistical mania to become a writer, or something else, we can only speculate. But when it came to the crunch, it seemed sufficient to make him break off the engagement rather than to reveal it to Regina. Thereafter, Kierkegaard frequently used marriage as a trope for "the universal" - especially for the universal demands made by social mores. Correlatively, becoming an "exception" was both a task and constantly in need of justification. The tortuous dialectic of universal and exception, worked out in terms of the sacrifices of love, subsequently informs much of Either/Or, Repetition, Fear and Trembling, Prefaces, and Stages on Life’s Way. A frequent foil for the trope of marriage as the universal is the figure of a young man "poeticized" by a broken engagement, who thereby becomes "an exception." Only when the young man is "poeticized" in the direction of the religious, however, is there any question of his being a "justified exception." Kierkegaard’s ultimate justification for breaking off his own engagement was his dedication to a life of writing as a religious poet, under the direction of divine Governance. As a measure of the importance the relationship to Regina had for his life, Kierkegaard adapted a line from Virgil’s Aeneid II,3 as "a motto for part of his life’s suffering": Infandum me jubes Regina renovare dolorem ("Queen [Regina], the sorrow you bid me revive is unspeakable").

c. The Master of Irony and the Seductions of Writing

During the period of his engagement Kierkegaard was also busy writing his Master's dissertation in philosophy, On the Concept of Irony: with constant reference to Socrates (1841). This was later automatically converted to a doctorate (1854). Kierkegaard had petitioned the king to write his dissertation in Danish - only the third such request to be granted. Usually academic dissertations had to be written and defended in Latin. Kierkegaard was allowed to write his dissertation in Danish, but had to condense it into a series of theses in Latin, to be defended publicly in Latin, before the degree would be awarded. Almost immediately after his dissertation defense, Kierkegaard broke off his engagement to Regina. He then undertook the first of four journeys to Berlin - his only trips abroad apart from a brief trip to Sweden. During this first trip to Berlin Kierkegaard completed most of the first volume of Either/Or (much of the second volume already having been completed).

Throughout the second half of the 1830s Kierkegaard had aspired to become part of the pre-eminent literary set in Copenhagen. This centered on Professor J.L. Heiberg, playwright, philosopher, aesthetician, journal publisher, and doyen of Copenhagen's literati. Heiberg had been credited with introducing Hegel’s philosophy to Denmark, though in fact there had already been lectures on Hegel by the Norwegian philosopher Henrik Steffens among others. Nevertheless, the fact that Heiberg gave Hegel’s work his imprimatur accelerated its acceptance into mainstream Danish intellectual life. By the end of the 1830s Hegelianism dominated Copenhagen’s philosophy, theology and aesthetics. Of course this engendered some resistance, including that from Kierkegaard’s professors of philosophy F.C. Sibbern and Poul Martin Møller. One of Hegelianism’s most illustrious local exponents was Kierkegaard’s archrival H.L. Martensen (professor of theology at Copenhagen University, later Bishop Primate of the Danish People’s Church). Martensen, just five years senior to Kierkegaard, was firmly entrenched in the Heiberg literary set, and anticipated at least one of Kierkegaard’s pet literary projects - an analysis of the figure of Faust. In his journals, as part of his practice at becoming a writer, Kierkegaard had been fascinated with three great literary figures from the Middle Ages, who he thought embodied the full range of modern aesthetic types. These figures were Don Juan, Faust, and the Wandering Jew. They embodied sensuality, doubt and despair respectively. Martensen’s publication on Faust pre-empted Kierkegaard’s budding literary project, though the latter eventually found expression in the first volume of Either/Or (1843). Meanwhile, Kierkegaard continued to seek Heiberg's seal of approval. His first major breakthrough was an address to the University of Copenhagen’s Student Association on the issue of freedom of the press. This was a satirical conservative riposte to a previous address in favor of more liberal press laws, and was the first broadside by Kierkegaard in a long career of lambasting the popular press, especially insofar as it supported political agitation for democracy. In this instance, however, it seemed motivated more by a desire to showcase his wit and erudition than by any deeper engagement with the political issues. The freedom of the press had been severely undermined by King Frederik VI’s ordinance of 1799, and was threatened with full censorship by his press legislation of 1834. The Society for the Proper Use of Press Freedom was formed in 1835 to combat this development. Kierkegaard followed up his speech with an article in Heiberg’s paper, The Copenhagen Flying Post (1836). The article, published pseudonymously, was so clever and polished that some people mistook it for the work of Heiberg himself. This amounted to his calling card for invitation to the Heiberg literary salon. Kierkegaard followed this with further pseudonymous articles on the same topic. But his first monograph was a 70-page review of Hans Christian Andersen's novel, Only a Fiddler. This too was a strategic move to break into the inner sanctum of Heiberg’s circle. Andersen was emerging as a major talent in Danish letters, having published poetry, plays and two novels, which had almost immediately been translated into German. Only a Fiddler was on a topic dear to Kierkegaard’s heart - genius. Andersen’s prime claim was that genius needs nurturing, and can succumb to circumstance and disappear without trace. Kierkegaard, in his book-length review From the Papers of One Still Living (1838), disagreed stridently, maintaining that the spark of genius could never be extinguished, but only augmented by adversity. Furthermore, he developed a theory of the novel in which he asserted that to be worth its salt, a novel had to be informed by a "life-view" and a "life-development." He criticized Andersen’s novel for its dependence on contingent features from Andersen’s own life, rather than being transfigured by a mature philosophy of life with clarity of purpose. He contrasted Andersen’s novel unfavorably in this respect with the novel by Heiberg’s mother, Thomasine Gyllembourg, A Story of Everyday Life. Kierkegaard was to return to Gyllembourg as a novelist in his review of her Two Ages in A Literary Review (1846). He was also to write a review of the work of Heiberg’s wife Louise, Denmark’s leading actress, in The Crisis and A Crisis in the Life of an Actress (1848).

d. The "Authorship": From Melancholy to Humor

Neither the articles in Heiberg's papers, nor the monograph on Andersen as novelist had gained Kierkegaard secure membership of Heiberg’s circle - though he was an occasional visitor there. With the breaking of his engagement to Regina, the completion of a major academic book (The Concept of Irony), his decision to devote himself to writing, and the trip to Berlin both to audit Schelling’s lectures (along with Karl Marx, Jacob Burckhardt and other luminaries) and to concentrate on his new literary project (Either/Or), Kierkegaard was about to embark on what he later, retrospectively, called his "authorship." This was eventually to comprise all the "aesthetic" pseudonymous works from Victor Eremita’s Either/Or to Johannes Climacus’s Concluding Unscientific Postscript, the Edifying Discourses under Kierkegaard’s own name (up to 1846), and Two Ages: The Age of Revolution and the Present Age: A Literary Review (by S. Kierkegaard). In short, these were the works published between Kierkegaard’s first and final visits to Berlin.

Either/Or burst upon the Copenhagen reading public with great force. It was immediately understood to be a major literary event. It was also regarded as scandalous by some, since its first volume portrayed the cynical, bored aestheticism of the modern flâneur, culminating in "The Seducer's Diary." Many, including Heiberg, took this to be a thinly disguised account of Kierkegaard’s own treatment of Regina Olsen. Most of the reviews, including Heiberg’s, concentrated on the scurrilous content of the first volume of the book. But other reviews read the two-volume work as a whole, and discovered the edifying and ethical framework in which the aesthetic point of view was to be assessed. Nevertheless, Heiberg’s review deeply offended Kierkegaard, and marked the point at which his relationship to Heiberg changed from aspiring associate to embittered critic. Hereafter in the "authorship" Heiberg became the target of unrelenting satire. He and Martensen were the main representatives of Danish Hegelianism, which is attacked at various points in the "authorship" - particularly in Prefaces (1844) and in Concluding Unscientific Postscript. It is worth noting that Hegel himself comes in for much less criticism, and much more positive endorsement, in Kierkegaard’s work than is commonly assumed. It is the Christian Hegelianism of Danish intellectuals that is the main target of his critiques. The "authorship" comprises two parallel series of texts. On the one hand are the pseudonymous works, which purportedly follow a dialectical trajectory of existential "stages" from the aesthetic, through the ethical, to the religious, and ultimately to the paradoxical religious stage of Christian faith. On the other hand are the Edifying Discourses, which are published under Kierkegaard's own name, which resemble sermons on biblical texts, and which are addressed to a readership already presumed to be Christian. The pseudonymous authorship starts with an existential type modeled on the German Romantic aesthete - the ironic, urbane flâneur whose main concern is to avoid boredom and to maintain a cerebral spectator’s interest in life and its sensuous pleasures. Ironically, this aesthete is beset with melancholy. His greatest happiness is his unhappiness, as the section of Either/Or entitled "The Unhappiest One" concludes. Although boredom is stated to be the negative motivation for the aesthete’s actions, at a deeper level we can discern that it is escape from melancholy and despair that are the real motivators. As part of the dialectical framework of the "authorship," Kierkegaard says there are also intermediate states between the discrete existential stages. These he calls "confinia" or border areas. Between the aesthetic and ethical stages lies the confinium of irony. Between the ethical and religious stages lies the confinium of humor. Humor is defined as "irony to a higher power" - so it does not wear its meaning on its sleeve. It is also to be understood as an inclusive, magnanimous state of affirming "both/and" (both the aesthetic and the ethical, both the tragic and the comic) rather than the ethically exclusive "either/or." The author of Concluding Unscientific Postscript, Johannes Climacus is a self-professed "humorist" in this sense. Although he purports to give the reader the truth about Christianity, he also "revokes" all he has said in that book. The religious humorist purports to go beyond the aesthetic and the ethical by choosing the religious exclusively, yet by virtue of the absurd, gets the aesthetic and the ethical back again within the religious. In terms of his own psychological economy, Kierkegaard seems to have been struggling to lose his melancholy and have it at the same time. It seems to have served him as an essential motor of aesthetic productivity, but was also a constant source of suffering from which he sought escape. For a long time Kierkegaard reconciled himself to his life of aesthetic self-indulgence as an author with the idea that it was all for a limited time. Once his "authorship' was complete, he would retire from writing and become a country pastor ministering to the souls of simple folk. Authorship was both a demonic temptation and a means of self-justification as an exception to the universal demands of society’s ethics. But just as he was on the point of completing the "authorship," Kierkegaard managed to provoke an attack on himself by the press, which demanded further work as an author in response.

e. The "Second Authorship": Self-Sacrifice, Love, Despair, and the God-Man

Kierkegaard provoked an attack on himself by the journal The Corsair. The journal, edited by the talented Jewish author Meïr Goldschmidt, specialized in ruthless satirical attacks on contemporary Danish authors. Yet, perhaps because of the esteem in which Goldschmidt held him, Kierkegaard had been spared. Kierkegaard found this favorable treatment offensive (partly out of vanity, ostensibly because of his ongoing critique of the press's influence on public opinion). So he publicly challenged The Corsair to do its worst. It did. It launched a series of attacks on Kierkegaard, more personal than literary, and focused on his odd appearance and his relationship with Regina. In some wicked caricatures it portrayed him with one trouser leg shorter than the other, with a sway back, and riding on a woman’s (Regina’s) back with stick in hand. These caricatures made a laughing stock of Kierkegaard in Copenhagen, to the extent that he was mocked in the street and had to give up his habit of walking around the inner city to talk with all and sundry.

But it galvanized him to begin a "second authorship." This time the edifying discourses under his own name were supplemented with works by the pseudonym Anti-Climacus. Anti-Climacus represents an idealized Christian point of view - one that Kierkegaard professed is higher than he had been able to achieve in his own life. The only other pseudonyms to appear in this "second authorship" were Inter et Inter, author of The Crisis and A Crisis in the Life of an Actress, and "H.H." author of "Two Ethical-Religious Essays." In addition the "second authorship" comprises: Works of Love (1847), The Sickness Unto Death (1849), Practice in Christianity (1850), as well as various edifying discourses, including Edifying Discourses in Various Spirits (1847), The Lily of the Field and the Bird of the Air (1849), Three Discourses at the Communion on Fridays (1849), Two Discourses at the Communion on Fridays (1851), and For Self-Examination (1851). He also published a retrospective self-interpretation of his writings to date, On My Work as an Author (under his own name - 1851). In addition Kierkegaard wrote various works at this time which he decided not to publish. The most significant of these are: The Book on Adler and The Point of View for My Work as an Author. The former gives a detailed analysis of the "phenomenon" of Adolph Adler, a pastor in the Danish People's Church who claimed to have had a divine revelation. He was deemed mad by the church authorities and pensioned off. Adler had been a leading Hegelian in the 1840s, but on Kierkegaard’s analysis ends up being "a Satire on Hegelian Philosophy and the Present Age." Kierkegaard makes an immanent critique of Adler’s writings to demonstrate their confusion and the absence of revelation. Kierkegaard published only the addendum to The Book on Adler as "The Difference between a Genius and an Apostle" in "Two Ethical Religious Essays." The Point of View for My Work as an Author sets out Kierkegaard’s (retrospective) interpretation of his authorship. It is subtitled: "A Direct Communication, Report to History." It explains in direct terms the dialectic of indirect communication, but Kierkegaard was uncertain whether its directness at that time was dialectically correct for the authorship and refrained from publishing it. The "second authorship" reintroduces various concepts from the "aesthetic authorship," but "transfigured" by the light of Christian faith. One of the most significant of these is "despair," which is a transfigured version of "anxiety." Both concepts are illuminated by reference to the notion of sin, and both are constitutive of the dialectic of selfhood. Only by acknowledging our ultimate dependence on God's grace is it possible to overcome despair, and to become a self (paradoxically by becoming as "nothing" before God). Another concept transfigured in the "second authorship" is "love." In the "aesthetic authorship" "love" is understood in pagan terms, primarily as eros - or desire. Desire is preferential, based on a lack (we only desire what we don’t have, according to Plato’s Symposium), and is ultimately selfish. Christian love is understood as agape. It is self-sacrificing, directed to the neighbor (without personal preference), is conceived as a spiritual duty rather than a psychological feeling, and comes as a gift from God rather than from the attraction between human beings. Its only perfect model is in the person of Jesus Christ, the God-man. We can see in the journey from eros in the "aesthetic authorship" to agape in the "second authorship" a personal attempt by Kierkegaard to sublimate his selfish desire for Regina into a self-sacrificing universal duty to love the neighbor. On his own terms this is impossible for a human being to achieve alone. It is only possible if love as agape is received as a gift by the grace of God.

f. The Attack on the Danish People's Church

The "authorship" and "second authorship" had been governed by Kierkegaard's elaborate method of "indirect communication." This method, inspired by Socrates and Christ, is designed to elicit self-examination from the reader in order to start the process of existential transfiguration that is entailed by Christian faith. It is designed to make it harder for the reader to appropriate the text objectively and dispassionately. Instead, the text is folded back on itself, layered with riddles and paradoxes, and designed to be a mirror in which the way the reader judges the text amounts to a self-judgment on the reader. The different works in the "authorships" are related to one another dialectically, so that a reader has to traverse a complicated journey to arrive at the threshold of Christian faith. The method of indirect communication requires meticulous attention to each word, and to the dialectical trajectory of the whole oeuvre. At times, the subtlety of the method nearly drove Kierkegaard to distraction, and he had to rely on the intervention of "Governance" [Styrelse], to let him know whether it was appropriate to publish the works he had written. On the Point of View for My Work as an Author: A Report to History, and The Book on Adler, failed to get Governance’s stamp of approval for publication.

But ultimately Kierkegaard began to think that this elaborate method of indirect communication, and his obsession with linguistic detail were temptations to the demonic. Besides, time was running out and some direct, decisive intervention in Danish church politics was necessary. This was precipitated by the death of the Bishop Primate of the Danish People's Church, J.P. Mynster (1854). Mynster had been the family pastor in Michael Kierkegaard’s day, and Søren Kierkegaard had always had a filial respect for him. But when the new Bishop Primate elect, H.L. Martensen, announced that Mynster had been "a witness to the truth" Kierkegaard could not restrain himself. He launched a stinging attack on the established church in a series of articles in the newspaper Fædrelandet [The Fatherland], and by means of a broadsheet called The Instant [or more literally "The Glint of an Eye"](1855) and in a series of other short, sharp pieces including This Must Be Said, So Let It Be Said (1855), and What Christ Judges of Official Christianity (1855). On September 28th 1855 Kierkegaard collapsed in the street. A few days later he was admitted to Frederiksberg Hospital in Copenhagen, where he died on November 11th.

2. The "Aesthetic Authorship"

a. On the Concept of Irony and Either/Or

Although Kierkegaard explicitly leaves On the Concept of Irony out of his "authorship," it functions as an important preface to that body of work. According to the theory of existential stages contained in the authorship, irony functions as a "confinium" [border area] between the aesthetic and the ethical. But it also functions as a point of entry to the aesthetic. As Kierkegaard argues in On the Concept of Irony, irony is a midwife at the birth of individual subjectivity. It is a distancing device, which folds immediate experience back on itself to create a space of self-reflection. In Socrates it is incarnated as "infinite negativity" - a force that undermines all received opinion to leave Socrates' interlocutors bewildered - and responsible for their own thoughts and values. That is, Socratic irony forces his interlocutors to reflect on themselves, to distance themselves critically from their immediate beliefs and values.

Although the aesthetic can consist in immediate immersion in sensuous experience, as in the case of Don Juan, Kierkegaard's most developed portrait is of the reflective aesthete in Either/Or volume 1. Faust is the first example of a reflective aesthete. He is lost in reflective ennui and craves a return to immediate experience. This is the basis of his attraction to Margarete, who embodies innocent immediacy. At its most extreme, the aesthete is unhappily and utterly self-alienated by means of temporal dislocation. "The Unhappiest One" - an echo of Hegel’s "unhappy consciousness" - hopes for that which can only be remembered, and remembers that which can only be hoped. He or she lives only in the modality of possibility and never in the modality of actuality, and therefore fails to be self-present. Yet, by means of reflective self-knowledge, the prudent rotation of moods and the arbitrary focus of interest, this "unhappiness" can be transformed into the greatest happiness for the aesthete. The "infinitizing" element of possibility becomes the realm of freedom, where even the most banal events can be "poeticized" by aesthetic sensibility. Actuality is transformed into nothing more than an occasion for generating reflective possibilities, rather than being an obstacle or a task. Johannes the seducer need see only a dainty ankle descending from a carriage to reconstruct the whole woman - just as Cuvier reconstructs the whole dinosaur from a single bone. The reconstruction, in the case of Johannes however, is not for the sake of knowing what’s real, but is for the sake of his own aesthetic titillation. If the actual doesn’t fit Johannes’ reflective desires, he manipulates it and himself until he generates a story that satisfies him. His seduction of Cordelia is not aimed at mere sexual consummation, but more at narrative consummation - she is to be used as an occasion, and manipulated in whatever ways Johannes deems necessary, to become the character in the story of seduction he has predetermined. But this detachment from the actual, by self-centered immersion in reflective possibility, is exactly what On the Concept of Irony had accused the German Romantics of achieving with their use of irony. The first volume of Either/Or just gives us a more developed version, artistically construed from the point of view of German Romantic irony. On the Concept of Irony had already argued for the necessity to go beyond immersion in irony, or mere possibility - to become a "master of irony," so that irony could be used strategically for ethical and religious ends. The title Either/Or presents us with a choice between the aesthetic and the ethical. The first volume is written from the point of view of the reflective aesthete, who has run astray in possibility. Although its main theme is love, this is conceived selfishly as erotic desire. The papers that comprise volume 1 are written ad se ipsum [to himself]. The aesthete's brilliant pyrotechnics are demonically self-enclosed, ironically cutting him off from genuine communication. The second volume, on the other hand, is written by a judge, who advocates transparency and openness in communication. It is written in the form of letters, as a direct communication to the aesthetic author of the first volume. The letters implore him to realize the limitations of his demonic self-enclosure, and to embrace his ethical duties to others. Whereas the paradigm of love in volume 1 is seduction, the paradigm of love in volume 2 is marriage. Marriage is a trope for the universal claims of civic duty. It requires an open, intimate, transparent, honest relation to an other. Yet the first section of volume 2 argues for the aesthetic validity of marriage. Judge Wilhelm wants to persuade the aesthete that ethical love is compatible with aesthetic love - that love in marriage does not exclude sensual enjoyment and love of beauty as such, but only the selfishness of lust for "the flesh." The latter is a category excluded by Christianity. It pertains to the body and psyche, to the exclusion of spirit, which is the definitive Christian category. Yet the claims of the judge ring hollow. Either/Or is presented as a whole book, edited by Victor Eremita (the victorious hermit). It presents us with a radical, exclusive choice between the aesthetic and the ethical, yet the judge tries to show their compatibility in marriage. The final word of the book belongs neither to the aesthete, the judge, nor even to the pseudonymous editor, but to an anonymous parson. His sermon, "The Edification Which Lies In The Fact That In Relation To God We Are Always In The Wrong," alerts the reader to the impossibility of escaping sin through ethics. The assumption shared by both the aesthete and the ethicist is that love can provide a means for ascent to the divine. Whereas erotic desire provides a means for the aesthete to ascend to a state of reflective possibility unconstrained by actuality, in which he becomes his own creator-god, the judge conceives ethical love to be a dialectical advance on aesthetic selfishness - in the direction of God. The whole pseudonymous authorship, from Either/Or to Concluding Unscientific Postscriptcan be read as a parody of the notion of a scala paradisi by means of which humans can ascend to the divine. The original model for this ladder to paradise is Plato's account of love [eros] in the Symposium. But the model is appropriated by many subsequent writers, including Augustine and Johannes Climacus, a sixth century monk from Mt. Sinai, who wrote a book called Scala Paradisi. Kierkegaard borrows this name for his pseudonymous author of Philosophical Fragments and Concluding Unscientific Postscript. But it is in order to parody the notion that humans can ascend to the divine under their own power. Each of the pseudonymous books in the "authorship" makes a gesture of movement from human to divine, whether by means of the aesthetic sublime, ethical virtue, the religious leap of faith, or philosophical dialectics. But in each case the apparent movement is "revoked" in some way. Ultimately Kierkegaard endorses the Lutheran view that human beings are radically dependent on God to descend to us. Human beings have no inherent capacity for transcending their own immanence, but are completely reliant on God’s grace to connect with alterity.

b. Fear and Trembling and Repetition

The next two books in the pseudonymous authorship, Fear and Trembling and Repetition, are supposed to represent a higher stage on the dialectical ladder - the religious. They are supposed to have moved beyond the aesthetic and the ethical. Fear and Trembling explicitly problematizes the ethical, while Repetition problematizes the notion of movement. Fear and Trembling reconstructs the story of Abraham and Isaac from the Old Testament. It tries to understand psychologically, ethically and religiously what Abraham was doing in obeying an apparent command from God to sacrifice his son. It apparently concludes that Abraham is "a knight of faith" who is religiously justified in his "teleological suspension of the ethical." The ethic in question here is the civic virtue championed by Judge Wilhelm in Either/Or - corresponding to Hegel's Sittlichkeit [customary morality]. The end for which this ethic is suspended is the unconditional command of God. But such obedience raises difficult epistemological questions - how do we distinguish the voice of God from, say, a delusional hallucination? The answer, which induces fear and trembling, is that we can only do so by faith. Abraham can say nothing to justify his actions - to do so would return him to the realm of human immanence and the sphere of ethics. The difference between Agamemnon, who sacrificed his daughter Iphigenia, and Abraham is that Agamemnon could justify his action in terms of customary morality. The sacrifice, however painful, was demanded for the sake of the success of the Greek military mission against Troy. Such sacrifices, for purposes greater than the individuals involved, were intelligible to the society of the time. Abraham’s sacrifice would have served no such purpose. It was unjustifiable in terms of prevailing morality, and was indistinguishable from murder. The ineffability of Abraham’s action is underscored by the pseudonym Kierkegaard chose as author of Fear and Trembling, namely, Johannes de silentio. But while Fear and Trembling is supposed to have moved beyond the aesthetic and the ethical, its subtitle is "a dialectical lyric." Although its subject matter is ineffable and its author silent, it effuses aesthetically on its theme. It ends with an "Epilogue" that asserts that, as far as love and faith go, we cannot build on what the previous generation has achieved. We have to begin from the beginning. We can never "go further."

Repetition begins with a discussion of the analysis of motion by the Eleatic philosophers. It goes on to distinguish two forms of movement with respect to knowledge of eternal truth: recollection and repetition. Recollection is understood on the model of Plato's anamnesis - a recovery of a truth already present in the individual, which has been repressed or forgotten. This is a movement backwards, since it is retrieving knowledge from the past. It can never discover eternal truth with which it was previously unacquainted. In contrast, repetition is defined as "recollection forwards." It is supposed to be the definitive movement of Christian faith. The pseudonym Constantin Constantius congratulates the Danish language on the word "Gjentagelse" [repetition], which more literally means "taking again." The emphasis in the Danish, then, is on the action involved in the repetition of faith rather than on the intellection involved in recollection. Christian faith is not a matter of intellectual reflection, but of living a certain sort of life, namely, imitating [repeating] the life of Christ. Despite this verbal analysis of the difference between recollection and repetition, the characters in Repetition fail to achieve religious repetition. The pseudonymous author fails in his attempt to repeat a journey to Berlin, and the "young man" who has been "poeticized" by love seems to move in the direction of the religious, but ultimately gets no further than religious poetry. He becomes obsessed with Job, the biblical paradigm of repetition. He substitutes the book of Job for the beloved he has rejected, even taking it to bed with him. But in the end the "young man" turns out to be no more than a fiction invented by Constantius as a psychological experiment. He falls back into the realm of aesthetics, of mere possibility, a figment for the psyche rather than the spirit.

c. Philosophical Fragments, The Concept of Anxiety, and Prefaces

In June 1844 Kierkegaard published three pseudonymous books: Philosophical Fragments, The Concept of Anxiety, and Prefaces. Philosophical Fragments, the first book by the pseudonym Johannes Climacus, tackles the question of how there can be an historical point of departure for an eternal truth. This picks up from Constantius' discussion of the difference between repetition and recollection. But Johannes uses the perspective and vocabulary of philosophy, rather than Constantius’ aesthetic irony. He introduces the paradox of the Christian incarnation as the stumbling block for any attempts by reason to ascend logically to the divine. The idea that the eternal, infinite, transcendent God could simultaneously be incarnated as a finite human being, in time, to die on the cross is an offense to reason. It is even too absurd an idea for humans to have invented, according to Climacus, so the idea itself must have a transcendent origin. In order for humans to encounter transcendent, eternal truth other than through recollection, the condition for reception of that truth must also have come from outside. If we have Christian faith, it is Christ as teacher who is the condition for receiving this truth - and he is conceived, precisely, as an incursion of the transcendent deity into the realm of human immanence. There can be no ascent to this truth by reason and logic, contra Hegel, who tries to demonstrate that "universal philosophical science" ultimately reveals "the Absolute."

The emphasis Climacus places on the paradox of the Christian incarnation, together with his assertion that this causes offense to reason, have prompted many to the view that Kierkegaard is an "irrationalist" about Christian faith. Some take this to mean that his view of faith is contrary to reason, or transcendent of reason - in either case, exclusive of reason. Others have sought to find means of reconciling Climacus' claims with some more extended notion of reason. It is important in considering these issues to distinguish Kierkegaard’s position from that of his pseudonym, and to take into account the point of view from which this consideration is made. Kierkegaard’s main aim in having Climacus make these claims is to undermine the idea that philosophical reason can be used as a scala paradisi. His principle target is Hegelianism, but he is also trying to distinguish pagan (especially Platonic) epistemology from Christian epistemology. We must also bear in mind that under the influence of Christian faith, all experience is transfigured ("everything is new in Christ"). This includes the experience of reason, as well as ethics and aesthetics. Ethics, for example, might be teleologically suspended in faith, but is recouped within Christian faith - though it comes to have another meaning. It is no longer merely customary morality, but is the morality sanctioned by Christian love, which is deontological, centered on spirit rather than sympathy, self-sacrificing, and is mediated by God (the "third" in every love relation). Similarly aesthetics is transfigured under Christian faith, from self-serving reflections confined to the realm of possibility, to the beauty inherent in altruistic self-effacing acts of love. Reason itself comes to have another meaning under Christian faith, so that it no longer takes offense at the paradox, but recognizes its necessity given the exigencies of relating the transcendent to the immanent without reduction. Reason is recontextualized within existence, rather than being elevated to absorb the whole of existence. Prefaces: Light Reading for Certain Classes as the Occasion May Require reinforces the polemic against Hegel's speculative ladder of reason. Although much of its content is devoted to satirical broadsides at J.L. Heiberg, H.L. Martensen, and the popular press in Copenhagen, its starting point is the paradox of philosophical prefaces articulated in the preface to Hegel’s The Phenomenology of Spirit. Hegel’s assumption is that a philosophical work should be a sort of Bildungsroman - a narrative by means of which the reader’s consciousness is dialectically developed in the course of reading. If we assume the reader is to learn something from the process of reading the book, then he or she will not be in a position to understand the conclusions of the book until they have worked their way through the content. By the time they reach the end they will be conditioned by what they have read to understand the conclusion. But a preface presents the conclusions to the book at the outset. It is really an anticipatory postface rather than a preface. The reader will really only be able to understand it after having read the book. It is meant for orientation of the reader on embarking on the voyage of self-development represented by the book. But if it is a direct bridge into the book, the subject matter itself, then it is really part of the book rather than a preface. If, on the other hand, it stands radically outside the book, then it can’t be a bridge into the book and is redundant. This gap between preface and book parallels the gap Hegel draws between "particular philosophical sciences" (such as aesthetics, and history of philosophy) and "universal philosophical science" (logic). The former must be used as a contingent starting point, commensurate with the limited knowledge of the reader, as a point of induction into logic. The particular can retrospectively be subsumed within the universal, but cannot be expanded to become the universal. It has been claimed, in accordance with this position, that if the reader understands the preface to Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, he or she understands the whole of Hegel’s philosophy. But the condition for understanding the preface is already to understand the whole of Hegel’s philosophy. The pseudonymous author of Prefaces, Nicholas Notabene, is a pedant whose wife has forbidden him to be an author. He takes an author to be a writer of books, and with cunning sophistry decides to write nothing but prefaces "which are not the prefaces to any books." Notabene's prefaces are analogues of human immanence - no amount of expansion will make them bridges to the transcendent. All human immanence is a "preface" to the divine. Only once the divine has come to us (in the incarnation or through direct revelation) can we retrospectively understand the status of our prefatory lives as mere prefaces. For Kierkegaard there is only one book - the bible. We are never "authors" of books, but only readers of "the old familiar text handed down from the fathers." On the same day as he published Prefaces Kierkegaard also published On the Concept of Anxiety by Vigilius Haufniensis [Watchman of the Harbor - namely, Copenhagen]. Its subtitle is "A Simple Psychologically Orienting Deliberation on the Dogmatic Issue of Hereditary Sin." It is supposed to be a serious counterweight to the "light reading" of Prefaces. But it forms part of the same polemic against immanent human efforts to reach the divine. From the points of view of psychology and theological dogmatics it elaborates the theme of the sermon appended to Either/Or - that against God we are always in the wrong. Sin is inescapable. Sin ultimately consists in being outside of God. Only Jesus Christ, the God-man, is not in sin. Sin consciousness comes into being as part of human psychological development. It is absent from the innocent immediacy of childhood. It awakens with sexual desire - when we want to possess another. Desire is here understood as a lack that we want to fill. Possession, or incorporation of the other, is thought to be the way to fulfill the desire. In erotic love it feels as though part of ourselves is outside of us, and needs to be reintegrated (as in Aristophanes' explanation of love in Plato’s Symposium). This is the beginning of self-alienation and the loss of innocent immediacy. Self-alienation is a necessary stage on the way to becoming a self. A self is a synthesis of finite and infinite, temporal and eternal, body and soul, held together by spirit. Only with the diremption of these aspects of the self, through self-alienation, does spirit arise. But spirit can only achieve the synthesis of self if it acknowledges its absolute dependence in this task on God ("the power that posits it"). Long before it gets to this stage, the person feels anxiety in the face of self-alienation. Anxiety is an ambivalent state, "a sympathetic antipathy and an antipathetic sympathy." It is the intimation of the delights of freedom, but also of the dread responsibility that is a consequence of freedom. Like vertigo, it is the simultaneous fascination and fear of the abyss - a hypnotic possibility of falling that induces the dizziness to actually fall. The main arena for the exercise of freedom is in becoming a self. But this requires alienation from one's immediate sensate being, taking ethical responsibility for one’s relations to other people, and acknowledgement of one’s ultimate dependence on God. Each of these entails risk - and hence anxiety. One of the risks involved is the possibility of falling prey to the demonic. A key definition of this notion is "self-enclosed reserve" [Indesluttethed] - a state in which the individual fails to relate to an other as other, but returns into him or herself in narcissism or solipsism. Kierkegaard feared that his convoluted, indirect writing could be his own form of the demonic, and ultimately opted for more direct forms of communication.

d. Stages on Life's Way and Concluding Unscientific Postscript

Like many of Kierkegaard's pseudonymous works, Stages on Life’s Way repeats elements from earlier pseudonymous works. In particular, it repeats the device of nesting narrators within narrators, it repeats characters from Either/Or and Repetition, and it "repeats" "The Seducer’s Diary" in "Quidam’s Diary." The latter was originally conceived at the same time as "The Diary of the Seducer" but was to differ by having the seducer undermined by his own depression once he had won the girl. Stages also repeats the idea built up over the sequence of pseudonymous works that human existence can be conceived as falling into distinct "stages" or "spheres," which are related in a dialectical progression. Stages repeats the same stages that have already been traversed in the preceding works, apparently without making any progress.

It is another example of the false ladder to paradise, exemplified by Plato's ladder of eros. The first major section of Stages, "In Vino Veritas," borrows its title from Plato’s Symposium and is modeled explicitly on that work, both structurally and thematically. It consists in a group of men at a banquet, each discoursing in turn on the nature of (erotic) love. This section of the book is followed by "Some Reflections on Marriage" by Judge Wilhelm, to give an ethical perspective on love. This is followed by "Quidam’s Diary," which is supposed to follow a trajectory from erotic love to religious consciousness. But Quidam’s diary is framed by the words of Frater Taciturnus (a distorted repetition of Johannes de silentio), in which he tells us that Quidam’s diary was retrieved from the bottom of a lake. It was enclosed in a box with the key locked inside - a