Category Archives: History of Analytic

Ordinary Language Philosophy

Ordinary Language philosophy, sometimes referred to as ‘Oxford’ philosophy, is a kind of ‘linguistic’ philosophy. Linguistic philosophy may be characterized as the view that a focus on language is key to both the content and method proper to the discipline of philosophy as a whole (and so is distinct from the Philosophy of Language). Linguistic philosophy includes both Ordinary Language philosophy and Logical Positivism, developed by the philosophers of the Vienna Circle (for more detail see Analytic Philosophy section 3). These two schools are inextricably linked historically and theoretically, and one of the keys to understanding Ordinary Language philosophy is, indeed, understanding the relationship it bears to Logical Positivism. Although Ordinary Language philosophy and Logical Positivism share the conviction that philosophical problems are ‘linguistic’ problems, and therefore that the method proper to philosophy is ‘linguistic analysis’, they differ vastly as to what such analysis amounts to, and what the aims of carrying it out are.

Ordinary Language philosophy is generally associated with the (later) views of Ludwig Wittgenstein, and with the work done by the philosophers of Oxford University between approximately 1945-1970. The origins of Ordinary Language philosophy reach back, however, much earlier than 1945 to work done at Cambridge University, usually marked as beginning in 1929 with the return of Wittgenstein, after some time away, to the Cambridge faculty. It is often noted that G. E. Moore was a great influence on the early development of Ordinary Language philosophy (though not an Ordinary Language philosopher himself), insofar as he initiated a focus on and interest in ‘commonsense’ views about reality. Major figures of Ordinary Language philosophy include (in the early phases) John Wisdom, Norman Malcolm, Alice Ambrose, Morris Lazerowitz, and (in the later phase) Gilbert Ryle, J. L. Austin and P. F. Strawson, amongst others. However, it is important to note that the Ordinary Language philosophical view was not developed as a unified theory, nor was it an organized program, as such. Indeed, the figures we now know as ‘Ordinary Language’ philosophers did not refer to themselves as such – it was originally a term of derision, used by its detractors. Ordinary Language philosophy is (besides an historical movement) foremost a methodology – one which is committed to the close and careful study of the uses of the expressions of language, especially the philosophically problematic ones. A commitment to this methodology as that which is proper to, and most fruitful for, the discipline of philosophy, is what unifies an assortment of otherwise diverse and independent views.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Cambridge
    1. Analysis and Formal Logic
    2. Logical Atomism
    3. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language
    4. Ordinary Language versus Ideal Language
  3. Ordinary Language Philosophy: Nothing is Hidden
    1. The Misuses of Language
    2. Philosophical Disputes and Linguistic Disputes
    3. Ordinary Language is Correct Language
    4. The Paradigm Case Argument
    5. A Use-Theory of Linguistic Meaning
  4. Oxford
    1. Ryle
    2. Austin
    3. Strawson
  5. The Demise of Ordinary Language Philosophy: Grice
  6. Contemporary Views
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Analysis and Formal Logic
    2. Logical Atomism
    3. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language
    4. Early Ordinary Language Philosophy
    5. The Paradigm Case Argument
    6. Oxford Ordinary Language Philosophy
    7. Criticism of Ordinary Language Philosophy
    8. Contemporary views
    9. Historical and Other Commentaries

1. Introduction

For Ordinary Language philosophy, at issue is the use of the expressions of language, not expressions in and of themselves. So, at issue is not, for example, ordinary versus (say) technical words; nor is it a distinction based on the language used in various areas of discourse, for example academic, technical, scientific, or lay, slang or street discourses – ordinary uses of language occur in all discourses. It is sometimes the case that an expression has distinct uses within distinct discourses, for example, the expression ‘empty space’. This may have both a lay and a scientific use, and both uses may count as ordinary; as long as it is quite clear which discourse is in play, and thus which of the distinct uses of the expression is in play. Though connected, the difference in use of the expression in different discourses signals a difference in the sense with which it is used, on the Ordinary Language view. One use, say the use in physics, in which it refers to a vacuum, is distinct from its lay use, in which it refers rather more flexibly to, say, a room with no objects in it, or an expanse of land with no buildings or trees. However, on this view, one sense of the expression, though more precise than the other, would not do as a replacement of the other term; for the lay use of the term is perfectly adequate for the uses it is put to, and the meaning of the term in physics would not allow speakers to express what they mean in these other contexts.

Thus, the way to understand what is meant by the ‘ordinary use of language’ is to hold it in contrast, not with ‘technical’ use, but with ‘non-standard’ or ‘non-ordinary’ use, or uses that are not in accord with an expression’s ‘ordinary meaning’. Non-ordinary uses of language are thought to be behind much philosophical theorizing, according to Ordinary Language philosophy: particularly where a theory results in a view that conflicts with what might be ordinarily said of some situation. Such ‘philosophical’ uses of language, on this view, create the very philosophical problems they are employed to solve. This is often because, on the Ordinary Language view, they are not acknowledged as non-ordinary uses, and attempt to be passed-off as simply more precise (or ‘truer’) versions of the ordinary use of some expression – thus suggesting that the ordinary use of some expression is deficient in some way. But according to the Ordinary Language position, non-ordinary uses of expressions simply introduce new uses of expressions. Should criteria for their use be provided, according to the Ordinary Language philosopher, there is no reason to rule them out.

Methodologically, ‘attending to the ordinary uses of language’ is held in general to be in opposition to the philosophical project, begun by the Logical Atomists (for more detail on this movement, see below, and the article on Analytic Philosophy, section 2d.) and taken up and developed most enthusiastically by the Logical Positivists, of constructing an ‘ideal’ language. An ideal language is supposed to represent reality more precisely and perspicuously than ordinary language. Ordinary Language philosophy emerged in reaction against certain views surrounding this notion of an ideal language. The ‘Ideal Language’ doctrine (which reached maturity in Logical Positivism) sees ‘ordinary’ language as obstructing a clear view on reality – it is thought to be opaque, vague and misleading, and thus stands in need of reform (at least insofar as it is to deliver philosophical truth).

Contrary to this view, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, it is the attempt to construct an ideal language that leads to philosophical problems, since it involves the non-ordinary uses of language. The key view to be found in the metaphilosophy of the Ordinary Language philosophers is that ordinary language is perfectly well suited to its purposes, and stands in no need of reform – though it can always be supplemented, and is also in a constant state of evolution. On this line of thought, the observation of and attention to the ordinary uses of language will ‘dissolve’ (rather than ‘solve’) philosophical problems – that is, will show them to have not been genuine problems in the first place, but ‘misuses’ of language.

On the positive side, the analysis of the ordinary uses of language may actually lead to philosophical knowledge, according to at least some versions of the view. But, the caveat is, the knowledge proper to philosophy is knowledge (or, rather, improved understanding) of the meanings of the expressions we use (and thus, what we are prepared to count as being described by them), or knowledge of the ‘conceptual’ structures our use of language reflects (our ‘ways of thinking about and experiencing things’). Wittgenstein himself would have argued that this ‘knowledge’ is nothing new, that it was available to all of us all along – all we had to do was notice it through paying proper attention to language use. Later Ordinary Language philosophers such as Strawson, however, argued that this did count as new knowledge – for it made possible new understanding of our experience of reality. Hence, on this take, philosophy does not merely have a negative outcome (the ‘dissolution’ of philosophical problems), and Ordinary Language philosophy need not be understood as quietist or even nihilist as has been sometimes charged. It does, however, turn out to be a somewhat different project to that which it is traditionally conceived to be.

2. Cambridge

The genesis of Ordinary Language philosophy occurred in the work of Wittgenstein after his 1929 return to Cambridge. This period, roughly up to around 1945, represents the early period of Ordinary Language philosophy that we may characterize as ‘Wittgensteinian’. We shall examine these roots first, before turning to its later development at Oxford (which we will continue to call ‘Oxford’ philosophy for convenience) – development that saw significant evolution and variation in the view.

The Cambridge period may be characterized as ‘Wittgensteinian’ because the Ordinary Language philosophers of the time were close followers of Wittgenstein. Many were his pupils at Cambridge, or associates of those pupils who later traveled to other parts of the world transmitting Wittgenstein’s thought, including Ambrose, Lazerowitz, Malcolm, Gasking, Paul, Von Wright, Black, Findlay, Bouwsma and Anscombe to name a few. (See P. M. S. Hacker (1996) for a more detailed historical account, and biographical details, of the Cambridge and Oxford associates of Wittgenstein.) They cleaved closely to the views they believed they found in Wittgenstein’s work, much of which was distributed about Cambridge, and eventually Oxford, as manuscripts or lecture notes that were not published until some time later (for example The Blue and Brown Books (1958) and the seminal Philosophical Investigations (1953)).

These ‘Wittgensteinians’ developed and propounded certain ideas and views, and indeed arguments and theories that Wittgenstein himself may not have approved (nor did Wittgenstein himself ever accept any label for his work, let alone ‘Ordinary Language’ philosophy). The Wittgensteinians saw themselves as developing and extending Wittgenstein’s views, despite the fact that the key principle in Wittgenstein’s work (both earlier and later) was that philosophical ‘theses’, as such, cannot be stated. Wittgenstein steadfastly denied that his work amounted to a philosophical theory because, according to him, philosophy cannot ‘explain’ anything; it may only ‘describe’ what is anyway the case (Philosophical Investigations, section 126-128). The Wittgensteinians developed more explicit arguments that tried to explain and justify the method of appeal to ordinary language than did Wittgenstein. Nevertheless, it is possible to understand what they were doing as remaining faithful to the Wittgensteinian tenet that one cannot propound philosophical theses insofar as claims about meaning are not in themselves theses about meaning. Indeed, the view was that the appeal to the ordinary uses of language is an act of reminding us of how some term or expression is used anyway – to show its meaning rather than explain it.

The first stirrings of the Ordinary Language views emerged as a reaction against the prevailing Logical Atomist, and later, Logical Positivist views that had been initially (ironically) developed by Wittgenstein himself, and published in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus in 1921. In order to understand this reaction, we must take a brief look at the development of Ideal Language philosophy, which formed the background against which Ordinary Language philosophy arose.

a. Analysis and Formal Logic

Around the turn of the 20th century, in the earliest days of the development of Analytic philosophy, Russell and Moore (in particular) developed the methods of ‘analysis’ of problematic notions. These methods involved, roughly, ‘re-writing’ a philosophically problematic term or expression so as to render it ‘clearer’, or less problematic, in some sense. This itself involved a focus on language – or on the ‘proposition’ – as part of the methodology of philosophy, which was quite new at the time.

This new spirit of precision and rigor paid particular attention to Gottlob Frege’s groundbreaking work in formal logic (1879), which initiated the development of the truth-functional view of language. A logical system is truth-functional if all its sentential operators (words such as ‘and’, ‘or’, ‘not’ and ‘if…then’) are functions that take truth-values as arguments and yield truth-values as their output. The conception of a truth-functional language is deeply connected with that of the truth-conditional conception of meaning for natural language. On this view, the truth-condition of a sentence is its meaning – it is that in virtue of which an expression has a meaning – and the meaning of a compound sentence is determined by the meanings of its constituent parts, that is the words that compose it. This is known as the principle of compositionality (see Davidson’s Philosophy of Language, section 1a, i).

Although formal symbolic logic was developed initially in order to analyze and explore the structure of arguments, in particular the structure of ‘validity’, its success soon led many to see applications for it within the realm of natural language. Specifically, the thought began to emerge that the logic that was being captured in ever more sophisticated systems of symbolic logic was the structure that is either actually hidden beneath natural, ordinary language, or it is the structure which, if not present in ordinary language, ought to be. What emerges in connection with the development of the truth-functional and truth-conditional view of language is the idea that the surface form of propositions may not represent their ‘true’ (or truth-functional) logical form. Indeed, Russell’s ‘On Denoting’ in 1905, which proposed a thesis called the Theory of Descriptions, argues just that: that underlying the surface grammar of ordinary expressions was a distinct logical form. His method of the ‘logical analysis of language’, based on the attempt to ‘analyze’ (or ‘re-write’) the propositions of ordinary language into the propositions of an ideal language, became known as the ‘paradigm of philosophy’ (as described by Ramsey in his 1931, pp. 321).

Both Russell and Frege recognized that natural language did not always, on the surface at any rate, behave like symbolic logic. Its elementary propositions, for example, were not always determinately true or false; some were not truth-functional, or compositional, at all (such as those in ‘opaque contexts’ like “Mary believes she has a little lamb”) and so on. In ‘On Denoting’ Russell proposed that despite misleading surface appearances, many (ideally, all) of the propositions of ordinary language could nevertheless be rewritten as transparently truth-functional propositions (that is, those that can be the arguments of truth-functions, and whose values are determinately either true or false, as given by their truth-conditions). That is, he argued, they could be ‘analyzed’ in such a way as to reveal the true logical form of the proposition, which may be obscured beneath the surface grammatical form of the proposition.

The proposition famously treated to Russell’s logical analysis in ‘On Denoting’ is the following: “The present King of France is bald.” We do not know how to treat this proposition truth-functionally if there is no present King of France – it does not have a clear truth-value in this case. But all propositions that can be the arguments of truth-functions must be determinately either true or false. The surface grammar of the proposition appears to claim of some object X, that it is bald. Therefore, it would appear that the proposition is true or false depending on whether X is bald or not bald. But there is no X. Russell’s achievement lies in his analysis of this proposition in (roughly and non-symbolically) the following way, which rendered it truth-functional (such that the truth-value of the whole is a function of the truth-values of the parts) after all: instead of “The present King of France is bald,” we read (or analyze the proposition as) “There is one, and only one, object X such that X is the present King of France (and) X is bald.” Now the proposition is comprised of elementary propositions governed by an existential quantifier (plus a ‘connective’– the word ‘and’), which can now be treated perfectly truth-functionally, and can return a determinately true or false value. Since the elementary proposition that claims that there is such an X is straightforwardly false, then by the rules of the propositional calculus this renders the entire complex proposition straightforwardly false. This had the result that it was no longer necessary to agonize over whether something that does not exist can be bald or not!

b. Logical Atomism

To the view that logical analysis would reveal a ‘logically perfect’ truth-functional language that lurked beneath ordinary language (but was obscured by it), Russell added that the most elementary constituents of the true logical form of a proposition (‘logical atoms’) correspond with the most elementary constituents of reality. This combination of views constituted his Logical Atomism (for more detail see Analytic Philosophy, section 2d). According to Russell, the simple parts of propositions represent the simple parts of the world. And just as more complex propositions are built up out of simpler ones, so the complex facts and objects in reality are built up out of simpler ones (Russell 1918).

Thus, the notion of the ‘true logical form’ of propositions was not only thought to be useful for working out how arguments functioned, and whether they were valid, but for a wider metaphysical project of representing how the world really is. The essence of Russellian Logical Atomism is that once we analyze language into its true logical form, we can simply read off from it the ultimate ontological structure of reality. The basic assumption at work here, which formed the foundation for the Ideal Language view, is that the essential and fundamental purpose of language is to represent the world. Therefore, the more ‘perfect’, that is ‘ideal’, the language, the more accurately it represents the world. A logically perfect language is, on this line of thought, a literal mirror of metaphysical reality. Russell’s work encouraged the view that language is meaningful in virtue of this underlying representational and truth-functional nature.

The Ideal Language view gave weight to the growing suspicion that ordinary language actually obscured our access to reality, because it obscured true logical form. Perhaps, the thought went, ordinary language does not represent the world as it really is. For example, the notion of a non-existent entity, suggested in the proposition about ‘the present King of France’ was simply one which arose because of the misleading surface structure of ordinary language, which, when properly ‘analyzed’, revealed there was no true ontological commitment to such a paradoxical entity at all.

Wittgenstein, in his Tractatus, took these basic ideas of Logical Atomism to a more sophisticated level, but also provided the materials for the development of the views by the Logical Positivists. An ideal language, according to Wittgenstein, was understood to actually share a structure with metaphysical reality. On this view, between language and reality there was not mere correspondence of elements, but isomorphism of form – reality shares the ‘logical form’ of language, and is pictured in it. Wittgenstein’s version of Atomism became known as the ‘picture theory’ of language, and ultimately became the focus of the view he later rejected. A rather confounding part of Wittgenstein’s argument in the Tractatus is that although this picturing relation between reality and language exists, it cannot itself be represented, and nor therefore spoken of in language. Thus, according to Wittgenstein, the entire Tractatus attempts to say what cannot be said, and is therefore a form of ‘nonsense’ – once its lessons are absorbed, he advised, it must then be rejected, like a ladder to be kicked away once one has stepped up it to one’s destination (1921, section 6.54).

c. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language

The Vienna Circle, where the doctrine of Logical Positivism (or ‘Logical Empiricism’ as it was sometimes called) was developed, included philosophers such as Schlick, Waismann, Neurath, and Carnap, amongst others. (See Coffa 1991, chapter 13 for an authoritative history of this period in Vienna.) This group was primarily interested in the philosophy of science and epistemology. Unlike the Cambridge analysts, however, who merely thought metaphysics had to be done differently, that is more rigorously, the Logical Positivists thought it should not be done at all. They acquired this rejection of metaphysics from Wittgenstein’s Tractatus.

According to the Tractatus, properly meaningful propositions divided into two kinds only: ‘factual’ propositions which represented, or ‘pictured’, reality and the propositions of logic. The latter, although not meaningless, were nevertheless all tautologous – empty of empirical, factual content. The propositions that fell into neither of these classes – according to Wittgenstein, the propositions of his own Tractatus – were ‘meaningless’ nonsense because, he claimed, they tried to say what could not be said. The Positivists did not accept this part of Wittgenstein’s view however, that is that what defined ‘nonsense’ was trying to say what could not be said. What they did believe was that metaphysical (and other) propositions are nonsense because they cannot be confirmed – there exists no procedure by which they may be verified. For the Positivists, ‘pseudo-propositions’ are those which present themselves as if they were factual propositions, but which are, in fact, not. The proposition, for example, “All atomic propositions correspond to atomic facts” looks like a scientific, factual claim such as “All physical matter is composed of atoms.” But the propositions are not of the same order, according to the Positivists – the former is masquerading as a scientific proposition, but in fact, it is not the sort of proposition that we know how to confirm, or even test. The former has, according to the view, no ‘method of verification’.

Properly ‘empirical’ propositions are those, according to the Positivists, that are ‘about’ the world, they are ‘factual’, have ‘content’ and their truth-values are determined strictly by the way the world is; but most crucially, they can be confirmed or disconfirmed by empirical observation of the world (testing, experimenting, observing via instruments, and so forth). On the other hand, the ‘logical’ propositions, and any that could be reduced to logical propositions for example analytic propositions, were not ‘about’ anything: they determined the form of propositions and structured the body of the properly empirical propositions of science. The so-called ‘Empiricist Theory of Meaning’ is, thus, the view that ‘the meaning of a proposition is its method of verification’, and the so-called ‘Verification Principle’ is the doctrine that if a proposition cannot be empirically verified, and it is not, or is not reducible to, a logical proposition, it is therefore meaningless (see Carnap 1949, pp. 119).

Logical Positivism cemented the Ideal Language view insofar as it accepted all of the elements we have identified; the view that ordinary language is misleading, and that underlying the vagueness and opacity of ordinary language is a precise and perspicuous language that is truth-functional and truth-conditional. From these basic ideas emerged the notion that a meaningful language is meaningful in virtue of having a systematic, and thus formalizable syntactic and semantic structure, which, although it is often obscured in ordinary language, could be revealed with proper philosophical and logical analysis.

It is in opposition to this overall picture that Ordinary Language philosophy arose. Ideal language came to be seen as thoroughly misleading as to the true structure of reality. As Alice Ambrose (1950) noted, ideal language was by this time “…[condemned] as being seriously defective and failing to do what it is intended to do. [This view] gives rise to the idea that [ordinary] language is like a tailored suit that does not fit” (pp. 14-15). Contrary to this notion, according to Ambrose, ordinary language is the very paradigm of meaningfulness. Wittgenstein, for example, said in the Philosophical Investigations that,

On the one hand it is clear that every sentence in our language ‘is in order as it is’. That is to say, we are not striving after an ideal, as if our ordinary vague sentences had not yet got a quite unexceptionable sense, and a perfect language awaited construction by us. - On the other hand it seems clear that where there is sense there must be perfect order. - So there must be perfect order even in the vaguest sentence. (Section 98)

d. Ordinary Language versus Ideal Language

It is notable that, methodologically, Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophy both placed language at the center of philosophy, thus taking the so-called ‘linguistic turn’ (a term coined by Bergmann 1953, pp. 65) – which is to hold the rather more radical position that philosophical problems are (really) linguistic problems.

Certainly both the Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophers argued that philosophical problems arise because of the ‘misuses of language’, and in particular they were united against the metaphysical uses of language. Both complained and objected to what they called ‘pseudo-propositions’. Both saw such ‘misuses’ of language as the source of philosophical problems. But although the Positivists ruled out metaphysical (and many other non-empirically verifiable) uses of language as nonsense on the basis of the Verification Principle, the Ordinary Language philosophers objected to them as concealed non-ordinary uses of language – not to be ruled out, as such, so long as criteria for their use were provided.

The Positivists understood linguistic analysis as the weeding out of nonsense, such that a ‘logic of science’ could emerge (Carnap 1934). A ‘logic of science’ would be based on an ideal language – one which is of a perfectly perspicuous logical form, comprised exhaustively of factual propositions, logical propositions and nothing else. In such a language, philosophical problems would be eliminated because they could not even be formulated. On the other hand, for the Ordinary Language philosophers, the aim was to resolve philosophical confusion, but one could expect to achieve a kind of philosophical enlightenment, or certainly a greater understanding of ourselves and the world, in the process of such resolution: for philosophy is seen as an ongoing practice without an ultimate end-game.

Most strikingly, however, is the difference in the views about linguistic meaning between the Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophers. As we’ve seen, the Ideal language view maintains a truth-functional and representational theory of meaning. The Ordinary Language philosophers held, following Wittgenstein, a use-based theory (or just a ‘use-theory’) of meaning. The exact workings of such a theory have never been fully detailed, but we turn to examine what we can of it below (section 3a). Suffice it to say here that, for the Ordinary Language philosopher, no proposition falls into a class – say ‘empirical’, ‘logical’, ‘necessary’, ‘contingent’ or ‘analytic’ or ‘synthetic’ and so forth in and of itself. That is, it is not, on a use-theory of meaning, the content of a proposition that marks it as belonging to such categories, but the way it is used in the language. (For more on this aspect of a use-theory, see for example Malcolm 1940; 1951.)

3. Ordinary Language Philosophy: Nothing is Hidden

The Ordinary Language philosophers, did not, strictly speaking, ‘reject’ metaphysics (to deny the existence of a metaphysical realm is itself, notice, a metaphysical contention). Rather, they ‘objected’ to metaphysical theorizing for two reasons. Firstly, because they believed it distorted the ordinary use of language, and this distortion was itself a source of philosophical problems. Secondly, they argued that metaphysical theorizing was superfluous to our philosophical needs – metaphysics was, basically, thought to be beside the point. Both objections rested on the view that our ordinary perceptions of the world, and our ordinary use of language to talk about them, are all we need to observe in order to dissipate philosophical perplexity. On this view, metaphysics adds nothing, but poses the danger of distorting what the issues really are. This position rests on Wittgenstein’s insistence that ‘nothing is hidden’.

Wittgenstein’s view was that whatever philosophy does, it simply describes what is open to view to anyone. Philosophy is not, on this approach, a matter of theorizing about ‘how reality really is’ and then confirming such philosophical ‘facts’ – generally, not obvious to everyday experience – through special philosophical techniques, such as analysis. Philosophy is, thus, quite distinct from the empirical sciences – as the Positivists agreed. For Ordinary Language philosophy, however, the distinction did not rest on issues of verification, but on the view that philosophy is a practice rather than an accumulation of knowledge or the discovery of new, special philosophical facts. This runs contrary to the traditional, ‘metaphysical’ view that ‘reality’ is somehow hidden, or underlies the familiar, the everyday reality we experience and must be ‘revealed’ or ‘discovered’ by some special philosophical kind of study or analysis. On the contrary Wittgenstein claimed:

Philosophy simply puts everything before us, and neither explains nor deduces anything.  – Since everything lies open to view there is nothing to explain. (Section 126)

…For nothing is hidden. (Section 435)

Metaphysical theorizing requires that language be used in ways that it is not ordinarily used, according to Wittgenstein, and the task proper to philosophy is to simply remind us what the ordinary uses actually are:

…We must do away with all explanation, and description alone must take its place. And this description gets its light, that is to say its purpose, from the philosophical problems. These are, of course, not empirical problems; they are solved rather by looking into the workings of our language, and that in such a way as to make us recognise these workings; in despite of an urge to misunderstand them. The problems are solved, not by giving new information, but by arranging what we have always known. Philosophy is a battle against the bewitchment of our intelligence by means of language. (Section 109)

What we do is bring words back from their metaphysical to their everyday use. (Section 116)

The idea that philosophical problems could be dissolved by means of the observation of the ordinary uses of language was referred to, mostly derogatively, by its critics as ‘therapeutic positivism’ (see the critical papers by Farrell 1946a and 1946b). It is true that the notion of ‘philosophy as therapy’ is to be found in the texts of Wittgenstein (1953, Section 133) and particularly in Wisdom (1936; 1953). However, the idea of philosophy as therapy was not an idea that was taken too kindly by traditional philosophers. The method was referred to by Russell as “…procurement by theft of what one has failed to gain by honest toil” (quoted in Rorty 1992, pp. 3). This view of philosophy was marked as a kind of ‘quietism’ about the real philosophical problems (a stubborn refusal to address them), and even as a kind of ‘nihilism’ about the prospects of philosophy altogether (once ‘misuses’ of language have been revealed, philosophical problems would disappear). It was only later at Oxford that Ordinary Language philosophy was eventually able to shrug off the association with the view that philosophical perplexity is a ‘disease’ that needed to be ‘cured’.

In the following sections, four important aspects of early Ordinary Language philosophy are examined, along with some of the key objections.

a. The Misuses of Language

In examining the view that metaphysics leads to the distortion of the ordinary uses of language, the question must also be answered as to why this was supposed to be a negative thing – since that is not at all obvious. An account is required of what the Ordinary Language philosophers counted as ‘ordinary’ uses of language, as non-ordinary uses, and why the latter was thought to be the source of philosophical problems, rather than elements of their solution.

The question of what counts as ‘ordinary’ language has been a pivotal point of objection to Ordinary Language philosophy from its earliest days. Some attempts were made by Ryle to get clearer on the matter (see 1953; 1957; 1961). For example, he emphasized, as we noted in the introduction, that it is not words that are of interest, but their uses:

Hume’s question was not about the word ‘cause’; it was about the use of ‘cause’. It was just as much about the use of ‘Ursache’. For the use of ‘cause’ is the same as the use of ‘Ursache’, though ‘cause’ is not the same word as ‘Ursache’. (1953, pp. 28)

He emphasized that the issue was ‘the ordinary use of language’ and not ‘the use of ordinary language’. Malcolm described the notion of the ordinary use of some expression thus:

By an “ordinary expression” I mean an expression which has an ordinary use, i.e. which is ordinarily used to describe a certain sort of situation. By this I do not mean that the expression need be one that is frequently used. It need only be an expression which would be used… To be an ordinary expression it must have a commonly accepted use; it need not be the case that it is ever used. (1942a, pp. 16)

The uses of expressions in question here refer almost entirely to what would ordinarily be said of some situation or state of affairs; what we (language users) would ordinarily call it a case of. So, of interest are the states of affairs that come under philosophical dispute, for example cases which we would ordinarily call cases of, say ‘free-will’, cases of ‘seeing some object’, cases of ‘knowing something for certain’ and so forth. It was Malcolm who, in his 1942a paper, first pointed out that non-ordinary uses of expressions occur in philosophy most particularly when the philosophical thesis propounded ‘goes against ordinary language’ – that is, when what the philosophical thesis proposes to be the case is radically different from what we would ordinarily say about some case (1942a, pp. 8).

To illustrate, take the term ‘knowledge’. According to Malcolm, its use in epistemological skepticism is non-ordinary. If one uttered “I do not know if this is a desk before me,” a hearer may assume that what is meant is that the utterer is unsure about the object before her because, for example the light is bad, or she thinks it might be a dining table instead of a desk or something similar. Something like this would be the, let us say, ordinary use of the term ‘know’. By way of contrast, if the utterer meant, by the expression, ‘I do not know if this is a desk before me, because I do not know the truth of any material-object statement, or I do not know if any independent objects exist outside my mind’ – then, we might say this was a non-ordinary use of the term ‘know’. We have not established that the non-ordinary use is at any disadvantage as yet. However, since if the latter was what one meant when one uttered the original statement, then one would have to explain this use to a hearer (unless the philosophical use was established to be in play at an earlier moment) – that is, one would have to note that “I do not know if this is a desk before me” is being used in a different sense to the other (non-skeptical) one. On this basis, the claim is that the first use is ordinary and the second, non-ordinary. Minimally, the expressions have different uses, and thus different senses, on this argument.

It might be objected that the skeptical use is perfectly ordinary – say, amongst philosophers at least. However, this does not establish that the skeptical use is the ordinary use, because the skeptical use depends on the prior existence, and general acceptance, of the original use. That is, the skeptical claim about knowledge could not even be formulated if it were not assumed that everyone knew the ordinary meaning of the term ‘know’ – if this were not assumed, there would be no point in denying that we have ‘knowledge’ of material-object propositions. Indeed, Ryle noted his sense of this paradox quite early on:

…if the expressions under consideration [in philosophical arguments] are intelligently used, their employers must always know what they mean and do not need the aid or admonition of philosophers before they can understand what they are saying. And if their hearers understand what they are being told, they too are in no such perplexity that they need to have this meaning philosophically “analysed” or “clarified” for them. And, at least, the philosopher himself must know what the expressions mean, since otherwise, he could not know what it was that he was analysing. (1992, pp. 85)

Often, the ordinary use of some expression must be presupposed in order to formulate the philosophical position in which it is used non-ordinarily.

Nevertheless, challenges to the very idea of ordinary versus non-ordinary uses of language came from other quarters. In particular, a vigorous dispute arose over what the criteria were supposed to be to identify ordinary versus non-ordinary uses of language, and why a philosopher assumes herself to have any authority on this matter. For example, Benson Mates argued, in his ‘On the Verifiability of Statements about Ordinary Language’ (1958, 1964) just what the title suggests: how can any such claims be confirmed? This objection applies more seriously to the later Ordinary Language philosophical work, because that period focused on far more detailed analyses of the uses of expressions, and made rather more sweeping claims about ‘what we say’. Stanley Cavell (1958, 1964) responded to Mates that claims as to the ordinary uses of expressions are not empirically based, but are normative claims (that is, they are not, in general, claims about what people do say, but what they can say, or ought to say, within the bounds of the meaning of the expression in question). Cavell also argued that the philosopher, as a member of a linguistic community, was at least as qualified as any other member of that community to make claims about what is, or can be, ordinarily said and meant; although it is always possible that any member of the linguistic community may be wrong in such a claim. The debate has continued, however, with similar objections (to Mates’) raised by Fodor and Katz (1963, 1971), to which Henson (1965) has responded.

The reason this objection applies less-so to the early Ordinary Language philosophers is that, for the Wittgensteinians, claims as to what is ‘ordinarily said’ applied in much more general ways. It applied, for example, to ‘what would ordinarily be said of, for example, a situation’ – for example, as we noted, cases of what we ordinarily call ‘seeing x’, or ‘doing x of her own free-will’, or ‘knowing “x” for certain’ and so forth (these kinds of cases were later argued to be paradigm cases – see below, section 3d, for a discussion of this important argument within early Ordinary Language philosophy). The Wittgensteinians were originally making their points against the kind of skeptical metaphysical views which had currency in their own time; the kinds of theories which suggested such things as ‘we do not know the truth of any material-thing statements’, ‘we are acquainted, in perception, only with sense-data and not external, independent objects’, ‘no sensory experience can be known for certain’ and so on. In such cases there is no question that the ordinary thing to say is, for example “I am certain this is a desk before me,” and “I see the fire-engine” and “It is true that I know that this is a desk” and so forth. In fact, in such disputes it was generally agreed that there was a certain ordinary way of describing such and such a situation. This would be how a situation is identified, so that the metaphysician or skeptical philosopher could proceed to suggest that this way of describing things is false.

The objection that was directed equally at the Wittgensteinians and the Oxford Ordinary Language philosophers was in regard to what was claimed to count as ‘misuses’ of expressions, particularly philosophical ‘misuses’. In particular, it was objected that presumably such uses must be banned according to Ordinary Language philosophy (for example Rollins 1951). Sometimes, it was argued, the non-ordinary use of some expression is philosophically necessary since sometimes technical or more precise terms are needed.

In fact, it was never argued by the Ordinary Language philosophers that any term or use of an expression should be prohibited. The objection is not born out by the actual texts. It was not argued that non-ordinary uses of language in and of themselves were a cause of philosophical problems; the problem lay in, mostly implicitly, attempting to pass them off as ordinary uses. The non-ordinary use of some term or expression is not, merely, a more ‘technical’ or more ‘precise’ use of the term – it is to introduce, or even assume, a quite different meaning for the term. In this sense, a philosophical theory that uses some term or expression non-ordinarily is talking about something entirely different to whatever the term or expression talks about in its ordinary use. Malcolm, for example, argues that the problem with philosophical uses of language is that they are often introduced into discussion without being duly noted as non-ordinary uses. Take, for example, the metaphysical claim that the content of assertions about experiences of an independent realm of material objects can never be certain. The argument (see Malcolm 1942b) is that this is an implicit suggestion that we stop applying the term ‘certain’ to empirical propositions, and reserve it for the propositions of logic or mathematics (which can be exhaustively proven to be true). It is a covert suggestion about how to reform the use of the term ‘certain’. But the suggested use is a ‘misuse’ of language, on the Ordinary Language view (that is, applying the term ‘certain’ only to mathematical or logical propositions). Moreover, the argument presents itself as an argument about the facts concerning the phenomenon of certainty, thus failing to ‘own up’ to being a suggestion about the use of the term ‘certain’ - leaving the assumption that it uses the term according to its ordinary meaning misleadingly in place. The issue, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, is that the two uses of ‘certain’ are distinct and the philosopher’s sense cannot replace the ordinary sense – though it can be introduced independently and with its own criteria, if that can be provided. Malcolm says, for example:

…if it gives the philosopher pleasure always to substitute the expression “I see some sense-data of my wife” for the expression “I see my wife,” etc.and so forth, then he is at liberty thus to express himself, provided he warns people beforehand, so that they will understand him. (1942a, pp. 15)

In an argument Malcolm elsewhere (1951) deals with, he suggests that it is not a ‘correct’ use of language to say, “I feel hot, but I am not certain of it.” But this is not to suggest that the expression must be banned from philosophical theorizing, nor that it is not possible that it might, at some point, become a perfectly correct use of language. What is crucial is that, for any use newly introduced to a language, how that expression is to be used must be explained, that is, criteria for its use must be provided. He says:

We have never learned a usage for a sentence of the sort “I thought that I felt hot but it turned out that I was mistaken.” In such matters we do not call anything “turning out that I was mistaken.” If someone were to insist that it is quite possible that I were mistaken when I say that I feel hot, then I should say to him: Give me a use for those words! I am perfectly willing to utter them, provided that you tell me under what conditions I should say that I was or was not mistaken.  Those words are of no use to me at present. I do not know what to do with them…There is nothing we call “finding out whether I feel hot.” This we could term either a fact of logic or a fact of language. (1951, pp. 332)

Malcolm went so far as to suggest the laws of logic may well, one day, be different to what we accept now (1940, pp. 198), and that we may well reject some necessary statements, should we find a use for their negation, or for treating them as contingent (1940, pp. 201ff). Thus, the objection that, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, non-ordinary uses, or new, revised or technical uses of expressions are to be prohibited from philosophy is generally unfounded – though it is an interpretation of Ordinary Language philosophy that survives into the present day.

b. Philosophical Disputes and Linguistic Disputes

There was no lack of voluble objection to the claim that philosophical disputes are ‘really linguistic’ (or sometimes ‘really verbal’). Therefore, it is essential to understand the Ordinary Language philosophers’ reasons for holding it to be true (although the later Oxford philosophers were generally less committed to it in quite such a rigid form). One of the most explicit formulations of this view is, once again, to be found in Malcolm’s 1942a paper. Its rough outline is this: in certain philosophical disputes the empirical facts of the matter are not at issue – that is to say, the dispute is not based on any lack of access to the empirical facts, the kinds of fact we can, roughly, ‘observe’. If the dispute is not about the empirical facts according to Malcolm, then the only other thing that could be at issue is how some phenomenon is to be described - and that is a ‘linguistic’ issue. This is particularly true of metaphysical disputes, according to Malcolm, who presents as examples the following list of ‘metaphysical’ propositions’ (1942a, pp. 6):

1. There are no material things

2. Time is unreal

3. Space is unreal

4. No-one ever perceives a material thing

5. No material thing exists unperceived

6. All that one ever sees when he looks at a thing is part of his own brain

7. There are no other minds – my sensations are the only sensations that exist

8. We do not know for certain that there are any other minds

9. We do not know for certain that the world was not created five minutes ago

10. We do not know for certain the truth of any statement about material things

11. All empirical statements are hypotheses

12. A priori statements are rules of grammar

According to Malcolm, affirming or denying the truth of any one of these propositions is not affirming or denying a matter of fact, but rather, Malcolm claims, “…it is a dispute over what language shall be used to describe those facts” (1942a, pp. 9). On what basis does he make this claim? The obvious objection on behalf of the metaphysician is that she certainly is talking about ‘the facts’ here, namely the metaphysical facts, and not about language at all.

Malcolm argues thus: he imagines a dispute between Russell and Moore, as illustrated by the propositions noted above. He takes as an example Russell’s assertion that “All that one ever sees when one looks at a thing is part of one’s own brain”. This is the sort of proposition that would follow from the philosophical thesis that all we are acquainted with in perception is sense-data, and that we do not perceive independent, external objects directly (See Russell 1927, pp. 383 – see also Sense-Data). Malcolm casts Moore (unauthorized by Moore it should be noted) as replying to Russell: “This desk which both of us now see is most certainly not part of my brain, and, in fact, I have never seen a part of my own brain” (Malcolm 1942a, pp. 7). We are asked to notice that there is no disagreement, in Russell and Moore’s opposing propositions, about the empirical facts of the matter. The dispute is not that one of either Russell or Moore cannot see the desk properly, or is hallucinating, in disagreeing whether what is before them is, or is not, a desk. That is, Russell and Moore agree that the phenomenon they are talking about is the one that is ordinarily described by saying (for example) “I see before me a desk.”

Malcolm asserts that “Both the philosophical statement, and Moore’s reply to it are disguised linguistic statements” (1942a, pp. 13 – my italics). Malcolm’s claim that this kind of dispute is not ‘empirical’ has less to do with a Positivistically construed notion of ‘verifiability’, and more to do with the contrast such a dispute has with a kind of dispute that really is empirical, or ‘factual’ – in the ordinary sense, where getting a closer look, say, at something would resolve the issue. The argument that the dispute is ‘really linguistic’ rests on Malcolm’s claim that when a philosophical thesis denies the applicability of some ordinary use of language, it is not merely suggesting that, occasionally, when we make certain claims, what we say is false. According to Malcolm, when a philosophical thesis suggests (implicitly), for example, that we should withhold the term ‘certain’ from non-analytic (mathematical or logical) statements, the suggestion is not that it is merely false to say one is certain about a synthetic (material-thing) statement – but that it is logically impossible. Malcolm tries to support his contention by drawing attention to the features apparent in the sort of dispute that is really about ‘the facts’, and one that he regards as, rather, really linguistic:

In ordinary life everyone of us has known of particular cases in which a person has said that he knew for certain that some material-thing statement was true, but that it has turned out that he was mistaken. Someone may have said, for example, that he knew for certain by the smell that it was carrots that were cooking on the stove. But you had just previously lifted the cover and seen that it was turnips, not carrots. You are able to say, on empirical grounds, that in this particular case when the person said that he knew for certain that a material-thing statement was true, he was mistaken…It is an empirical fact that sometimes when people use statements of the form: “I know for certain that p”, where p is a material-thing statement, what they say is false. But when the philosopher asserts that we never know for certain any material-thing statements, he is not asserting this empirical fact…he is asserting that always…when any person says a thing of that sort his statement will be false. (1942a, pp. 11)

So, Malcolm proposes that, since their dispute is not empirical, or contingent, we ought to understand Russell as saying that “…it is really a more correct way of speaking to say that you see part of your brain than to say that you see [for example] a desk” and we have Moore saying that, on the contrary, “It is correct language to say that what we are doing now is seeing [a desk], and it is not correct language to say that what we are doing now is seeing parts of our brains” (1942a, pp. 9).

The obvious objection here is to the claim that the dispute is linguistic rather than about the phenomenon of, for example perception itself. For example, C. A. Campbell (1944) remarks that: seems perfectly clear that what [these] arguments [such as the one’s mentioned by Malcolm] [are] concerned with is the proper understanding of the facts of the situation, and not with any problem of linguistics: and that there is a disagreement about language with the plain man only because there is a disagreement about the correct reading of the facts...The philosopher objects to such [ordinary] statements   only in the context of philosophical discourse where it is vital that our words should accurately describe the facts. (pp. 15)

This objection is further echoed in Morris Weitz (1947), responding to Malcolm’s Ordinary Language treatment of the propositions of epistemic skepticism, such as “no-material thing statement is known for certain”:

The first thing that needs to be pointed out is that philosophers who recommend the abolition of the prefix ‘it is certain that’ as applied to empirical statements do not suggest that the language of common sense is mistaken.  What they mean to say to common sense is that its language is alright provided that its interpretation of the facts is all right. But the interpretation is not all right; therefore, the articulation of the interpretation is mistaken, and needs revision. [Thus]...will we not, and more correctly say, common sense and its language are here in error and....incline a little with Broad to the view that common sense, at least on this issue, ought to go out and hang itself. (pp. 544-545)

A more contemporary version of this objection, which applies to the idea that philosophical disputes are about concepts and thoughts (rather than the ordinary uses of language) may be found in Williamson (2007). He argues that not all philosophy is (the equivalent of) ‘linguistic’, because philosophers may well study objects that have never (as yet) been thought or spoken about at all (‘elusive objects’). He says:

Suppose, just for the sake of argument, that there are no [such] elusive objects. That by itself would still not vindicate a restriction of philosophy to the conceptual, the realm of sense or thought. The practitioners of any discipline have thoughts and communicate them, but they are rarely studying those very thoughts: rather, they are studying what their thoughts are about. Most thoughts are not about thoughts. To make philosophy the study of thought is to insist that philosophers’ thoughts should be about thoughts. It is not obvious why philosophers should accept that restriction. (pp. 17-18)

The general gist of the objection was that philosophy is just as perfectly the study of facts as any other science, except what is under investigation are metaphysical rather than physical facts. There is no reason, on this objection, to understand metaphysical claims as claims about language. The early Ordinary Language philosophers did not formulate a complete response to this charge. Indeed, that the charge is still being raised demonstrates that it still has not been answered to the satisfaction of its critics. Some attempts were made to emphasize, for example, that an inquiry about how some X is to be described ought not be distinguished from an inquiry into the nature of X (for example Austin 1964; Cavell 1958, pp. 91; McDowell 1994, pp. 27) – given that we have no obviously independent way to study such ‘natures’. This appears not to have convinced those who disagree, however.

It was also part of a defence to this objection to appeal to the so-called ‘linguistic doctrine of necessity’. The terminology popular in the day is partly to blame for the general disdain of this view (which was only a ‘doctrine’ as such in the hands of the Positivists), as it sounds as though the claim is that necessary propositions, because they are ‘linguistic’, are not to be understood as being about the world and the way things are in it, but about words, or even about the ways words are used. This of course would have the result that necessary propositions turn out to be contingent propositions about language use, which was correctly recognised to be absurd (as noted in Malcolm 1940, pp. 190-191). This was rather more how the Positivists described the doctrine. For them, the thought in distinguishing ‘linguistic’ from ‘factual’ propositions was that the former are ‘rules of language’, and therefore truth-valueless, or ‘non-cognitive’. But on the Ordinary Language philosophers’ view, necessary propositions are not (disguised) assertions about the uses of words, they are ‘about’ the world just as all propositions are (and so are perfectly ‘cognitive’ bearers of truth-values). On the other hand, what makes them count as necessary, what justifies us in holding them to be so, is not any special metaphysical fact; only the ordinary empirical fact that this is how some of the propositions of language are used. (op.cit. 1940, pp. 192; 1942b) On this view, it is through linguistic practice that we establish the distinction between necessary and contingent propositions. We have met this idea already in some preliminary remarks about a use-theory of meaning (in section 2d above).

However, even on the more amenable use-based interpretation of the linguistic doctrine of necessity, metaphysicians still wish to insist that some necessities are, indeed, metaphysical, and not connected with the uses of propositions at all – for example, that nothing is both red and green all over, that a circle cannot be squared, and so forth. Thus, the objection persists that in philosophy what one is doing is inquiring into facts, that is, the nature of phenomena, the general structure and fundamental ontology of reality, and not at all the meanings of the expressions we use to describe them. Indeed, it seems to be the most prevalent and recurrent complaint against ‘linguistic’ philosophy, and it seems to be an argument in which neither side will be convinced by the other, and thus one that will probably go on indefinitely. At least one question that has not fully entered the debate is why a ‘linguistic’ problem is understood to be so philosophically inferior to a metaphysical one.

c. Ordinary Language is Correct Language

The contention ‘ordinary language is correct language’ forms the rationale, or justification, for the method of the appeal to ordinary language. This is a basic and fundamental tenet on which it is safe to say all Ordinary Language philosophers concur, more or less strongly. However, it has been often misunderstood, and the misunderstanding has unfortunately in part been attributable to the early Ordinary Language philosophers. The misunderstanding lies in conflating the notion of ‘correctness’ with the notion of ‘truth’. It appears that the Ordinary Language philosophers themselves did not always make this distinction clearly enough, nor did they always adhere to it, as we shall see below. We shall examine one formulation of the argument to the conclusion that ‘ordinary language is correct language’, and see that it need not be (as it very often has been) understood as a claim that what is said in the ordinary use of language must thereby be true (or its converse: that whatever is said in using language non-ordinarily must thereby be false).

The latter interpretation of Ordinary Language philosophy was, and is, widespread. For example, Chisholm, in 1951, devoted a paper to rejecting the claim that “Any philosophical statement which violates ordinary language is false” (pp. 175). The converse, that any statement which is in accord with ordinary language is true is a version of what came to be known as the ‘paradigm case argument’, which we shall examine in the following section.

Once again, the classic formulation of the argument to the conclusion that ‘ordinary language is correct’ is to be found in Malcolm’s 1942a paper. His argument is roughly this: not only are metaphysical philosophical disputes not based on any facts, but metaphysical claims are, generally, claims to necessary rather than ordinary, contingent truth (that is, a philosophical thesis does not claim that sometimes we cannot be certain of a material-thing statement, for that is perfectly true and we all know this; rather the philosophical thesis says that it is never the case that such statements are certain). We should note that it is at least debatable whether a metaphysical thesis might be presented as contingent (See article on Modal Illusions). Certainly for the most part, metaphysical theses are presented as necessary truths, as there are separate difficulties in doing otherwise. Malcolm’s argument is that these metaphysical theses, which contradict the ordinary uses of language, have the semantic consequence that the ordinary uses of expressions fail to express anything at all.

No metaphysician would argue for this explicitly. Indeed, most suggest that the ordinary expression they contest, or that is ultimately contested by their thesis, is ‘just wrong’, that is, merely false. The thought is that the folk get certain things wrong all the time and need to be corrected: the empirical sciences are the model here. But the analogy with science is misleading, since science only shows us that certain ways we describe things may turn out to be contingently false. But, if the metaphysically necessary propositions in question turn out to be true, that is, the ones that are inconsistent with ordinary language, the result is not that our ordinary ways of describing certain phenomena or situations turn out to be merely false. Rather, our ordinary uses of language would turn out to express that which is necessarily false – they would express, or try to express, that which is metaphysically impossible.

According to Malcolm, the implication that what is expressed in certain ordinary uses of language is necessarily false, or metaphysically impossible, renders those uses ‘self-contradictory’ (1942a, pp. 11). What he means is this: if it turns out that, say, the proposition “One never perceives a material object” is true, then because it is necessarily true, it is therefore impossible (for us) to perceive a material object. Therefore, material objects are (for us) imperceptible. So, to assert “I perceive a material object” is not merely to state a falsehood (like saying “The earth is flat”), but to state something like “I perceive something that is imperceptible.” If a metaphysical thesis is necessarily true, and it contradicts what would be said ordinarily, then the latter is necessarily false, and to assert a necessarily false proposition is to fail to assert anything at all. Failing to assert anything, in the utterance of an assertion, is to fail to use the language correctly – and this is the implicit upshot of some metaphysical theses.

On the contrary, Malcolm claims, such a misuse of language is impossible, because “The proposition that no ordinary expression is self-contradictory is a tautology” (pp. 16 – my italics). This is not to say that whatever is said using language ordinarily is thereby actually true. Malcolm insists that there are two ways one can ‘go wrong’ in saying something; one way is to be wrong about the facts, the second way is to use language incorrectly. And so he notes that it is perfectly possible to be using language correctly, and yet state something that is plainly false. But, on this view, one cannot be uttering self-contradictions and at the same time be saying something true or false for that matter. The assertion of contradictions, according to this view, has no use for us in our language (so far at least), and therefore they have no meaning (clearly, this is an aspect of the use-theory of meaning at work). On the other hand, according to Malcolm, to have a use just is to have a meaning. Thus, any expression that does have a use cannot also be ‘meaningless’ – or self-contradictory. ‘Correct’ language, therefore, is language that is or would be used, and is therefore meaningful, on this argument. Given the nature of our language, we do not, as a matter of fact, use self-contradictory expressions to describe situations (literally, sincerely and non-metaphorically that is) – although we do say such things as “It is and it is not,” but we do not say of such uses that one is contradicting oneself (see Malcolm 1942a, pp. 16 for more on uttering contradictions). He says:

The reason that no ordinary expression is self-contradictory is that a self-contradictory expression is an expression which would never be used to describe any sort of situation. It does not have a descriptive usage. An ordinary expression is an expression which would be used to describe a certain sort of situation; and since it would be used to describe a certain sort of situation, it does describe that sort of situation. A self-contradictory expression, on the contrary, describes nothing. (1942a, pp. 16)

It is on the basis of this argument that Malcolm claims that Moore, in the imagined dispute with Russell, actually refutes the philosophical propositions in question - merely by pointing out that they do ‘go against ordinary language’ (1942a, pp. 5). It is here that we get some insight into why it was assumed that Ordinary Language philosophy argued that anything said in the non-ordinary use of language must be false (and anything said in ordinary language must be true): Malcolm after all does say that what Moore says refutes the skeptical claims and shows the falsity of the proposition in question.

However, it must be kept in mind that what Malcolm is claiming to be true and false here are the linguistic versions of the dispute: he claims that Moore’s assertion that “It is a correct use of language to say that ‘I am certain this is a desk before me’” is true – he does not argue that Moore has proven there is a desk before him. Moreover, the philosophical proposition Moore has proven to be false is not “No material-thing statement is known for certain,” but the claim that “It is not a correct use of language to say ‘I am certain this is a desk before me’.” What Malcolm has argued, even if he himself did not make this entirely clear (and perhaps even deliberately equivocated on), is that certain claims about what is a correct (ordinary) use of language are true or false. His is not an argument with metaphysical results, and he has not shown, through Moore, that any version of skepticism is false. Indeed, the metaphysical thesis itself is beside the point. If the skeptic insists that, although it may be an incorrect use of language to say “I am not certain that this is a desk before me,” it may nevertheless be true, then the onus is on the skeptic to explain why it is that our ordinary claims to ‘know’ such and such are, therefore, not merely contingently false, but necessarily false. By Malcolm’s lights, this would amount to the skeptic claiming that this particular part of our use of language, that is, that involving some ordinary claims to ‘know’ such and such, is self-contradictory; yet, for Malcolm, as we have seen, this is not possible, because ordinary language is correct language. At any rate, in assessing the Ordinary Language argument, it is clear that the claim that philosophical propositions are incorrect uses of language and the claim that what they express is false ought not be conflated.

Although Malcolm has not refuted the skeptic, he nevertheless has demonstrated that there are some semantic difficulties in formulating the skeptical thesis in the first place – since it requires the non-ordinary use of language. This places additional, hitherto unacknowledged constraints on certain skeptical and metaphysical theses. Either the skeptic/metaphysician must acknowledge the non-ordinary use of the expression in question, or she must argue that we must reform our ordinary use. In the first case, she must then acknowledge that her thesis concerns something other than what we are ordinarily talking about when we use the term in question (for example ‘know’, ‘perceive’, ‘certain’, and so forth). In the second case, she must convince us that our ordinary use of the expression has, hitherto unbeknownst to us, been a misuse of language: we have, up till now, been asserting something that is necessarily false. Someone, in the imagined philosophical dispute, is failing to use language correctly, or failing to express anything in their description of some phenomenon. The dilemma the skeptic faces is that neither of theses two possibilities is a comfortable one for her to explain, although maintaining the truth of her thesis. This dilemma creates a situation for the skeptic that, although not refuting her directly, poses a possibly insurmountable challenge to meaningfully formulating her thesis.

d. The Paradigm Case Argument

The so-called ‘paradigm-case argument’ generated a good deal of debate (for example Watkins 1957; Richman 1961; Flew 1966; Hanfling 1990). It plays a significant role in Ordinary Language philosophy, because it tends to be interpreted as the mistaken view that Ordinary Language philosophy contends that what is said in ordinary language must be true. This is a prime example, as will be shown, of conflating the claim that ordinary language is correct with the claim that what is expressed in the ordinary use of some expression is true.

It was understood that the paradigm-case argument was an argument that shows that there must be (at least some) true instances, in the actual and not merely possible world, of anything that is said (referred to) in ordinary language. For example, Roderick Chisholm (1951) says “There are words in ordinary language, Malcolm believes, whose use implies that they have a denotation. That is to say, from the fact that they are used in ordinary language, we may infer that there is something to which they truly apply” (pp. 180). On this interpretation, certain metaphysical truths, indeed empirical truths, could be proven simply by the fact that we use a certain expression ordinarily. This seems clearly an absurd position to take, and does not, once again, appear to be supported by the texts.

Malcolm invokes what is now known as the paradigm-case argument by reference to one of the outcomes on the assumption that the philosophical claims he is examining are true. If we consider, say, the thesis that “No-one ever knows for certain the truth of any material-thing statement” to be true, then on that theory it turns out that an ordinary expression such as “I am certain there is a chair in this room” is never true, no matter how good our evidence for the claim is – indeed, regardless of the evidence. Malcolm casts the ‘Moorean’ reply to such a view, that “[On the contrary] both of us know for certain there are several chairs in this room, and how absurd it would be to suggest that we do not know it, but only believe it, or that it is highly probable but not really certain!” (1942a, pp. 12) Malcolm says,

What [Moore’s] reply does is give us a paradigm of absolute certainty, just as in the case previously discussed his reply gave us a paradigm of seeing something not a part of one’s brain. What his reply does is to appeal to our language-sense; to make us feel how queer and wrong it would be to say, when we sat in a room seeing and touching chairs, that we believed there were chairs but did not know it for certain, or that it was only highly probable that there were chairs… Moore’s refutation consists simply in pointing out that [the expression “know for certain”] has an application to empirical statements. (1942a, pp. 13)

Here, he says nothing to the effect that Moore has proven that it is true that there are in fact chairs and tables before us, and so forth. All Malcolm has claimed is that Moore has denied, indeed disproven, the suggestion that the term ‘certainty’ has no application to empirical statements. He has disproven that by invoking examples where it is manifestly the case that the term ‘certainty’ has been, and can be, ‘applied’. Nothing, notice, has been said as to whether there really are tables, chairs and cheese before us - unless, that is, we confuse ‘having an application’ with ‘having a reference’ or ‘having a true application’. But it is not necessary to interpret the claims this way. ‘Having an application’ means, as Malcolm argues, having a use in a given situation. Malcolm’s example in the quote above is a ‘paradigm of absolute certainty’, but not, notice, a proof of what it is that one is certain of. It is a ‘paradigm of absolute certainty’ because it is a prime example of the sort of situation, or context in which the term ‘certain’ applies – it is a paradigm of the term’s use: namely, in situations where we have very good (though not infallible) evidence, and no reason to think that our evidence is not of the highest quality. Indeed, on Malcolm’s view, a ‘paradigm case’ is an example of the ordinary use and hence the ordinary meaning of an expression.

The point of appealing to paradigm cases, then, is not to guarantee the truth of ordinary expressions, but to demonstrate that they have a use in the language. Thus, the paradigm-case argument is an effective move against any view that implies that some ordinary expression does not have a use, or application – for example that what we call ‘certain’ (well-evidenced non-mathematical statements) are not ‘really’ certain. That the ordinary use of expressions should be incorrect is, on Malcolm’s argument, as impossible as it would be for the rules of chess to be incorrect (and therefore that what we play is not ‘really’ chess).

e. A Use-Theory of Linguistic Meaning

The ‘use-theory’ of meaning, whose source is Wittgenstein and which was adopted by the Ordinary Language philosophers, objects to the idea that language could be treated like a calculus, or an ‘ideal language’. If language is like a calculus, then its ‘meanings’ could be specified, so that determinate truth-conditions could be paired with every expression of a language in advance of, and independently of, any particular use of a term or expression in a speech-act. Therefore, the observation of our actual uses of expressions in the huge variety of contexts and speech-acts we do and can use them in would be irrelevant to determining the meaning of expressions. On the contrary, for the Ordinary Language Philosopher, linguistic meaning may only be determined by the observation of the various uses of expressions in their actual ordinary uses, and it is not independent of these. Thus, Wittgenstein claimed that:

For a large class of cases – though not for all – in which we employ the word “meaning” it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language. (Section 43)

Does this mean that only sometimes ‘meaning is use’? The remark has been interpreted this way (for example Lycan 1999, pp. 99, fn 2). But it need not be. We need to notice that in the remark, Wittgenstein refers to ‘cases where we employ the word “meaning,”’ and not ‘cases of meaning’. The difference, it might be said, is that sometimes when we use the term ‘meaning’ we are not talking about linguistic meaning. That is, we may talk about for example “The meaning of her phone call,” in which case we are not going to be assisted by looking to the use of the word ‘phone call’ in the language. On the other hand, when we use the word ‘meaning’ as in “The meaning of ‘broiling’ is (such and such),” then looking to the use of the word ‘broiling’ in the language will help. Thus, an interpretation is possible in which the remark does not mean that only sometimes ‘meaning is use’. Rather, we can interpret it as claiming that linguistic meaning is to be found in language use.

At the most fundamental base of a use-theory, language is not representational - although it is sometimes (perhaps even almost always) used to represent. On the view, the ‘meaning’ of a term (or expression) is exhausted by its use: there is nothing further, nothing ‘over and above’, the use of an expression for its meaning to be.

A good many objections have been raised to this theory, which we cannot here examine in full. However, most appear to object to it because it apparently rules out the possibility of a systematic theory of meaning. If meaning-is-use, then the ideal language approach is out of the question, and determining linguistic meaning becomes an ad-hoc process. This thought has displeased many, as they have understood it to entail something of an end to the possibility of a philosophy of language per se. Dummett (1973), for example, has complained that:

…[although] the ‘philosophy of ordinary language’ was indeed a species of linguistic philosophy, [it was] one which was contrary to the spirit of Frege in two fundamental ways, namely in its dogmatic denial of the possibility of system, and in its treatment of natural language as immune from criticism. (pp. 683)

Soames (2003) goes on to echo the same complaint:

Rather than constructing general theories of meaning, philosophers were supposed to attend to subtle aspects of language use, and to show how misuse of certain words leads to philosophical perplexity and confusion. [Such a view] proved to be unstable… What is needed is some sort of systematic theory of what meaning is, and how it interacts with these other factors governing the use of language. (pp. xiv)

It was ultimately the re-introduction of the possibility of a systematic theory of meaning by Grice, later at Oxford (see section 5, below), that finally spelled the end for Ordinary Language philosophy.

4. Oxford

By the 1940s, the views of the later Wittgenstein, and the Wittgensteinians, had penetrated Oxford. There, philosophers took up the ideas of Wittgenstein, but they were much more critical and much more interested in developing their own views. The move now was to apply the principles to be found in Wittgenstein, and to show how they could actually contribute significantly to philosophy – rather than merely make philosophical problems ‘disappear’. ‘Oxford’ philosophy was still ‘linguistic’, but much less dogmatically so, much more flexible in its approach, much less interested in metaphilosophical justification for their views and rather more interested in applying their views to real, current, philosophical problems. The Oxford philosophers no longer treated all philosophical problems as mere ‘pseudo-problems’, nor even all of them as ‘linguistic’. But nevertheless they retained the view that philosophical uses of language can be a source of philosophical confusions and that the observation and study of ordinary language would help to resolve them. What was new, regarding Ordinary Language philosophy, was the rejection of Wittgenstein’s idea that there could be no proper ‘philosophical’ knowledge.

Austin famously remarked:

Certainly ordinary language has no claim to be the last word, if there is such a thing. It embodies, indeed, something better than the metaphysics of the Stone Age, namely… the inherited experience and acumen of many generations of men. But then, that acumen has been concentrated primarily upon the practical business of life. If a distinction works well for practical purposes in ordinary life (no mean feat, for even ordinary life is full of hard cases), it will not mark nothing: yet this is likely enough to be not the best way of arranging things if our interests are more extensive or intellectual than the ordinary… Certainly, then, ordinary language is not the last word: in principle it can everywhere be supplemented and improved upon and superseded. Only remember, it is the first word. (And forget, for once and for a while, that other curious question “Is it true?” May we?) (1956, pp. 185 and fn 2 in parentheses)

a. Ryle

Ryle emerged at Oxford as one of the most important figures in early 20th century analytic philosophy. Ryle, indeed, became a champion of ‘ordinary language’, writing, in his early career, a number of papers dealing with such issues as what counts as ‘ordinary’ language, what are the nature of ‘meanings’, and how the appeal to ordinary ways of describing things can help resolve philosophical problems (including his 1931, 1953, 1957, 1961). In particular, Ryle became famous for his treatment of mental phenomena in his Concept of Mind (1949). The book contains, overall, a ‘behaviorist’ analysis of mental phenomena that draws heavily on Wittgensteinian anti-Cartesianism – or anti-dualism (of ‘mind’ and ‘body’). On this view, the mind is not a kind of ‘gaseous’ but non-spatial, non-physical medium of thoughts, nor is it a kind of ‘theatre’ via which we observe our own experiences and sensations. Our mental life is not, according to Ryle, a private domain to which each individual has exclusive access. Our psychological language expresses our thoughts; it does not describe what is going on in the mind in the same way that physical language describes what is going on in the body, according to Ryle in this period.

The ‘Cartesian Myth’ of the mind – what Ryle calls the “Dogma of the Ghost in the Machine” (1949, pp. 15) – is perpetuated, according to Ryle, because philosophers commit what he calls a ‘category mistake’ in applying the language of the physical world to the psychological world (for example, talking about ‘events’ and ‘causes’ in the mind as we would talk of such things in the body). Contrary to this ‘myth’, according to Ryle, our access to our own thoughts and feelings are not, like our access to those of others, something we observe about ourselves (by looking ‘inward’ as opposed to ‘outward’). We do not observe our thoughts; we think them. What we call ‘beliefs’, ‘thoughts’, ‘knowledge’, ‘feelings’, and so forth are not special kinds of ‘occult’ objects ‘inside’ the mind. As regards ‘other minds’, psychological phenomena are available publicly in certain behaviors (which are not mere ‘signs’ of what is going on internally in others, but partially what constitutes what it is to attribute such things, for example, as ‘believing X’, ‘thinking about Y’, and so forth). Ryle arrives at these views through the analysis of the ordinary uses of psychological expressions, remarking:

I am not, for example, denying that there occur mental processes. Doing long division is a mental process and so is making a joke. But I am saying that the phrase ‘there occur mental processes’ does not mean the same thing as ‘there occur physical processes’, and, therefore it makes no sense to conjoin or disjoin the two. (1949, pp. 22)

The view Ryle promotes is that the expressions we use in attributing psychological states and the expressions we use in attributing physical states have quite distinct uses, and that when we see this aright, we see that it does not make sense to conflate them in claims such as ‘an intention in her mind caused her arm to rise’ (the sort of things one might expect on the ‘Ghost in the Machine’ theory). In everyday life, we know perfectly well, for example, what the criteria are in virtue of which we count a person as, for example, thinking, calculating, having raised an arm intentionally, and so forth. Puzzlement only arises, according to Ryle, when philosophers try to account for mental phenomena according to the ‘logic’ of the category of physical phenomena, for example, talking about the mystery of ‘mental causation’.

By highlighting the ordinary use of mental-phenomena expressions, and the ways in which we ordinarily ascribe them to people (for example, “She is thinking about home,” “I wish I had a cup-cake,” “He is adding up the bill,” and so on), Ryle shows that the philosophical problem of how mental phenomena can interact with physical phenomena is poorly formulated. The manner in which psychological terms are used in such philosophical problems, theories, and so forth, are not the same ways the terms are used in ordinary discourse. Using the terms in this way leads philosophers to conclude either that some form of dualism of mind and body or some form of physicalism is true (see Mental Causation for more on the traditional theories of mind). But observing our ordinary uses of psychological terms shows, Ryle argues, that as we mean them to describe ourselves and one another (and sometimes even when we apply psychological terms to non-people), mental phenomena need not be understood as ‘internal’ events that we observe, nor as reducible, in some sense, to mere brain-states.

b. Austin

Austin, at Oxford, first took up the issue of the so-called ‘sense-data’ theory, originally formulated by Russell (as we saw above). His Sense and Sensibilia (1962) (a pun on Jane Austen’s Sense and Sensibility) is a classic of ordinary language analysis. It contrasts the ordinary uses of the words ‘looks’, ‘seems’, ‘appears’ ‘perceives’, and so forth to the ways they are used in support of the sense-data theory. The argument for sense-data is, partially, based on the view that we are unable to distinguish between veridical experience and illusion. Therefore, the reasoning goes, all we can be sure of is what is common to both experiences, which is the ‘seeming to be such and such’ or sense-data. So, on the view, because it is possible that any experience may be an illusion, the only thing that is certain is the sense-data before the mind. Of this theory Austin says:

My general opinion about this doctrine is that it is a typically scholastic view, attributable…to an obsession with a few particular words, the uses of which are over-simplified, not really understood or carefully studied or correctly described…The fact is, as I shall try to make clear, that our ordinary words are much subtler in their uses, and mark many more distinctions, than philosophers have realized; and that the facts of perception…are much more diverse and complicated than has been allowed for. (1962, pp. 3)

Austin points out, amongst other things, that, as a matter of fact we do know the difference between a veridical and an illusory experience, and we speak of such experiences differently – the distinction between ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ has an established, and ordinary, use in language. For example, a stick placed in a glass of water appears to be bent, but we have criteria for describing the difference between this bent stick and a stick which is bent outside the glass. We say, “the stick looks bent” in the water, but we say, “the stick is bent” of the other. The availability of ways in language to mark the distinction between illusions and veridical experiences demonstrates, according to Austin, that the sense-data argument is invalid - because those terms, which have ordinary uses in language, are misused in the sense-data theory. For example, if the sense-data theory is true, then we are marking nothing in our experience when we distinguish between ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ experiences – those expressions have no real meaning (we are failing to express anything in their utterance). The same would follow, if the sense-data theory were correct, that our ordinary uses of cognate terms such as ‘appearing’, ‘looking’, ‘seeming’, and so forth, and also ‘finding out that X was not as it appeared to be’ have no application – since there would be no ‘real’ distinction, for us, between how things appear and how they really are. This conclusion, from which it follows that we should withdraw the terms ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ from use in language, is absurd – the distinction is marked in language and therefore exists (for example, between the way things ‘look’ and the way things ‘are’ – though we are not always infallible in our judgments). The question whether or not the distinction corresponds with a metaphysical reality (“But do sticks really exist,” and so forth), is a question about some other distinction – not the distinction we draw, in ordinary use, between ‘appears to be’ and ‘is’. And so, by attending to the ordinary uses of terms such as ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ and their cognates, Austin shows that the philosophical use of them in formulating the sense-data thesis is based on a misconstrual of their ordinary meanings.

Austin became a master of the observation of the uses of language. He noted nuanced differences in the ways words very close in meaning are used that many others missed. He showed that, even in its most ordinary uses, language is indeed a much finer, sensitive and precise instrument than had previously been acknowledged. Such observations belie the view that ordinary language is somehow deficient for the purposes of describing reality. Austin demonstrated, through his explorations, the flexibility of language, how subtle variations in meaning were possible, how delicate, sometimes, is the choice of a word for saying what one wants or needs to say. He called his method ‘linguistic phenomenology’ (1956, pp. 182). What his demonstrations of the fineness of grain of meaning, in very concrete and particular examples, showed was that philosophical uses of language take expressions out of their ordinary working environment, that is, everyday communicative discourse. Wittgenstein described this as ‘language going on holiday’ (1953, section 38). Such philosophical uses, Austin showed, treat expressions as rigid, one-dimensional, rather blunt instruments, with far less descriptive power than ordinary language: thus contradicting the view that the philosophical uses of language are more ‘accurate’ and ‘precise’.

Austin is also well known for his original work on what is now known as ‘speech-act’ theory, in his How to Do Things with Words (based on his William James Lectures delivered at Harvard in 1955, published as a monograph in 1962). Key to Austin’s achievement here was his development of the idea that the utterances of sentences in the use of language are not all of the same kind: not all utterances represent some aspect of the world (for example, not all utterances are assertions). Some, perhaps many, utterances involve executing actions. Austin’s example is the making of a promise. To utter “I promise to pay you back” is, on Austin’s analysis, to perform an act, that is to say, the very act of promising is carried out in uttering the sentence, rather than the sentence describing a state of affairs (that is, oneself in the state of promising). Austin developed an extensive taxonomy of the uses of language, establishing firmly the notion that language goes beyond simple representation, and has social and pragmatic dimensions that must be taken into account by any adequate theory of linguistic meaning.

c. Strawson

Strawson, who was a pupil of Grice, developed in his mature work a Kantian thesis aiming to uncover the most fundamental categories of thought. This project, which Strawson called a ‘descriptive metaphysics’, was to investigate what he called our ‘fundamental conceptual structure’. Strawson understood the philosophical project to require more than the appeal to ordinary language. He said,

Up to a point, the reliance upon a close examination of the actual use of words is the best, and indeed the only sure, way in philosophy. But the discriminations we can make, and the connexions we can establish, in this way are not general enough and not far-reaching enough to meet the full metaphysical demand for understanding. For when we ask how we use this or that expression, our answers, however revealing at a certain level, are apt to assume, and not to expose, those general elements of the structure that the metaphysician wants revealed. (1959, pp. 9-10)

The investigation of our conceptual structure had to involve more than the observation of our ordinary uses of language (which only assume that structure), but, nevertheless, the project, via transcendental argument, remained one of description of our ordinary ways of experiencing the world. Strawson’s view, contrary to the Wittgensteinian doctrine that philosophy is no more than descriptive of what is open to view to anyone, was that descriptive metaphysics involved the acquisition of genuinely new philosophical knowledge, and not merely the resolution of philosophical confusion. In this project, however, Strawson did not stray altogether too far from the Ordinary Language philosophical commitments (compare Strawson 1962, pp. 320), and his ‘linguistic’ philosophical credentials remained sound. Nevertheless, he believed that there was a deeper metaphysical reality concerning our conceptual structure that needed uncovering via a ‘descriptive metaphysics’. Strawson influenced the shift in philosophical interest from language to concepts – but the methodology and metaphilosophical rationale remained the same: the view that there is no route to a ‘metaphysical reality’ that is independent of our experience of it. Our experience of reality is, on this view, mediated by our particular conceptual structure, and a careful description of our ordinary experience – through the appeal to ordinary language – will help us to understand the nature of the conceptual structure.

Earlier in his career, Strawson criticized Russell’s revered Theory of Descriptions in his 1950 paper ‘On Referring’. Here Strawson objected that Russell failed to take into account the fact that not all uses of sentences make either true or false statements. If we distinguish ‘sentences’ and ‘statements’, indeed, we shall see that sentences are not always used to make statements. Sentences have many and varied uses, but are not, in and of themselves, true or false; what they are used to say may well be true or false (but there are also other uses than statement-making). Strawson argued that Russell had conflated meaning with, roughly, a truth-condition (or a reference). He said, on the contrary, that,

… the question whether a sentence or expression is significant or not has nothing whatever to do with the question of whether the sentence, uttered on a particular occasion, is, on that occasion, being used to make a true-or-false assertion or not, or of whether the expression is, on that occasion, being used to refer to, or mention, anything at all… the fact that [a sentence] is significant is the same as the fact that it can be correctly used to talk about something and that, in so using it, someone will be making a true or false assertion. (1950, pp. 172-173)

This position presaged a much more contemporary debate between those who hold that the meaning of a sentence remains invariant over contexts of use, and those who hold the contrary (see below, section 6).

In 1956, Strawson and his teacher, H. P. Grice, together published a paper that attacked Quine’s repudiation of the so-called ‘analytic-synthetic’ distinction. The repudiation is based on the idea that because the distinction has a use in the language, certainly in philosophy - but it is a distinction that is also marked outside of philosophy - then it has an inviolable place in language. They say, “…‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’ have a more or less established [philosophical and ordinary] use; and this seems to suggest that it is absurd, even senseless, to say there is no such distinction” (1956, pp. 43). This is a classic example of the so-called ‘paradigm-case argument’. When Quine denies the analytic-synthetic distinction, it is to suggest that the distinction has no application. But that suggestion is demonstrably false, since we do apply the distinction (or more prosaic cognates of ‘analytic’, for example, ‘synonymous’ or ‘means the same as’, and so forth). Whether or not there is a metaphysical reality to which this distinction corresponds is quite superfluous to the reality that it is a distinction that has a use in the language, and its use alone justifies its being a perfectly meaningful one to make (1956, pp. 143).

5. The Demise of Ordinary Language Philosophy: Grice

It was ultimately Grice who came to introduce, at Oxford, some of the first ideas that marked the significant fall from grace of Ordinary Language philosophy. Other factors combined to contribute to the general demise of Ordinary Language philosophy, in particular the rise in popularity of formal semantics, but also a renewed pursuit of ‘naturalism’ in philosophy, aimed at drawing the discipline nearer, once again, to the sciences. In this climate, aspects of the ‘ideal language’ view emerged as dominant, mostly manifesting in a commitment to a truth-conditional view of meaning in the philosophy of language. Grice had a special place in this story because his work, as well as providing the argument which threw Ordinary Language philosophical principles into doubt, contributed to the development of a field of study that ultimately became the wellspring of those carrying on the legacy of the Ordinary Language philosophers in the 21st century; namely speech-act theory.

Grice’s version of ‘speech-act theory’ (see also section 4c of Philosophy of Language) included an ‘intention-based’ theory of communication. The basic principle of speech-act theory (as Austin, and Grice following him, developed it) is that language is not merely a system of symbols that represent things – the process of communication is a result of interaction between agents, and the pragmatic aspects of communication must be factored into any account of linguistic meaning. As Austin emphasized, language use is, in part, the performance of actions, as well as the representation of the world. In particular, for Grice, part of what matters, for a theory of language, is what the agent intends to communicate. One of the most important concepts introduced by Grice is that of conversational implicature (see the chapter entitled ‘Logic and Conversation’ in his 1989). The notion of conversational implicature suggests that part of what is communicated, in conversation, is communicated pragmatically rather than semantically. For example, take the following sentences:

(a) He took out his key and opened the door.

(b) Jones got married and had children.

(c) (looking in the refrigerator) “There is no beer.”

We might understand (a) to imply that he opened the door with the key he took out. But, the words alone do not strictly say this. Similarly, in (b), we might understand that Jones got married and had children in that order, and such that the two events are connected in the relevant way, and in (c), we generally understand the claim to be about the lack of beer in the fridge, not in the universe. In all of these examples, according to Grice, information is communicated, not by the semantics of the sentences alone, but by the pragmatic process he calls conversational implicature. (For more detail on Grice’s taxonomy of pragmatic processes, and also his views about the ‘maxims of conversation’, see Grice 1989.)

Pragmatic aspects of communication, according to Grice, must be distinguished from the strictly semantic aspects, and thus, according to him, meaning must not be confused with use. But this, on his view, is precisely what the Ordinary Language philosophers do, insofar as their ‘appeal to ordinary language’ is based on the view that meaning is determined by use (see the chapter entitled ‘Prolegomena’ in his 1989). Indeed, Grice here launches a detailed attack on many of the ‘ordinary language’ analyses put forward by, amongst others, Wittgenstein, Ryle, Austin, Malcolm and Strawson. In each case, Grice argues that where the Ordinary Language philosopher appeals to the use of the expression, especially in order to throw doubt on some other philosophical theory, what occurs is the failure to distinguish meaning (that is, ‘semantic content’ or ‘truth-conditions’) and use (that is, pragmatic aspects of communication such as implicature). Therefore, the argument that philosophical non-ordinary uses of expressions are a problem for metaphysical theses is itself at fault. (It should be noted that, this view notwithstanding, Grice remained more or less in agreement with the general view that ‘ordinary language is correct’ - compare Grice, the chapter entitled ‘Postwar Oxford Philosophy’ in his 1989.)

The general criticism, from Grice, is that the arguments of the Ordinary Language philosophers cannot be run on the basic semantics of expressions – they can apply only to the uses particular expressions are put to in specific examples. This complaint touches on the actual claims Ordinary Language philosophers have made about the use and meaning of certain expressions – in particular, claims as to when it would or would not ‘make sense’ to say “X,” or to use “X” in a certain way. To recall an example we are now familiar with - the term ‘know’ - Grice argued that, for example, when Malcolm contended that the skeptical use of ‘know’ is a misuse of that term, that this claim shows nothing relevant about the meaning of the term or the expressions in which it features. The oddness, for example, of applying the term ‘know’ in certain ways, for example, in “I feel pain, but I do not know for sure” is generated by the pragmatic features of that particular use, and is independent of the strictly semantic features.

Grice’s argument about distinguishing meaning and use appeals to the notion of the existence of an independent semantics of a language – that is, the idea that the expressions of a language have meanings which are both independent of, and invariant over, the wide variety of uses those expressions might figure in. Thus, on this view, a ‘philosophical’ and an ‘ordinary’ use of some expression do not differ in meaning – contrary to the claim of Ordinary Language philosophy. Thus, for example, an expression has an invariant semantic content even though, in its use, it may have a variety of conversational implicatures. However, the latter, on this view, are not part of the ‘meaning’ proper. Thus, observations about variations in the use of some expression will tell us nothing about its meaning.

The upshot of this argument is that the so-called ‘paradoxical’ statements attributed to classical metaphysical philosophy by the Ordinary Language philosophers may not be so paradoxical after all. Moreover, and perhaps more significantly, what this view made possible once again was the pursuit of a systematic theory of language. Use-theories could not, on the received view, be ‘systematic’ in the way required (broadly: computational). Indeed, Grice remarked, “My primary aim is… to determine how any such distinction between meaning and use is to be drawn, and where lie the limits of its philosophical utility. Any serious attempt to achieve this aim will, I think, involve a search for a systematic theory of language…” (1989, pp. 4).

The view that there ought to be possible a ‘systematic’ theory of language gained considerable ground on the passport given it by Grice. That is, if the distinction between meaning and use is correct, then a good deal of the linguistic phenomena pointed out by the Ordinary Language philosophers, and which was supposed to have ramifications for the meaning, and therefore correct use, of expressions can now be fully accounted for by a variety of ‘pragmatic’ aspects of communication. Therefore, the core, classical semantic theory for a language could continue to be pursued more or less independently of issues connected with language use; and pragmatics can generally be called upon to account for any linguistic phenomena that semantics cannot.

Of course, this argument depends on the ability of the Gricean to sufficiently identify something like the ‘literal meaning’ of a sentence (that which is to be designated the ‘semantic’ rather than the ‘pragmatic’ content of a speech-act); and in which it may occur independently of any particular conversational implicatures it is used to convey, on an occasion of use. Isolating such a literal, invariant meaning has, however, proven difficult. For example, Charles Travis (1996; 1999) has pointed out, a variety of ways that a sentence may be used quite literally, non-metaphorically, seriously and sincerely – and yet still express two distinct propositions, that is, have two distinct truth-conditions and thus fail to have an invariant semantic content. A classic ‘Travis-style’ example is a sentence such as “Pass me the red book.” Such a sentence could be used, quite literally, non-metaphorically, and so forth, to request someone to pass the book that has a red cover, and it can be used to request someone to pass the book which has only a red spine. What counts as ‘red’ in these cases is different: that is, a thing can be completely, or only partially, red to count in certain contexts. This difference in what is expressed cannot be classified as conversational implicature, so both propositions are properly semantically expressed. But Grice’s distinction is supposed to show how to isolate one semantic content, or proposition, or truth-condition per sentence. Hence the Gricean has a problem in accounting for a semantic-pragmatic distinction in the content of speech-acts – a distinction that is required for the argument against Ordinary Language philosophy to work

6. Contemporary Views

The remainder of the 20th century saw the rise of the general ‘ideal language’ approach, including a commitment to versions of truth-conditional theories of meaning, to a position of dominance. However, in recent years (the early 21st century), there has been something of a renaissance of the ideas originating in Ordinary Language philosophy. François Recanati (2004) remarked that,

Despite [that] early antagonism… semantics (the formal study of meaning and truth-conditions) and pragmatics (the study of language in use) are now conceived of as complementary disciplines, shedding light on different aspects of language… Instructed by Grice they systematically draw a distinction between what a given expression means, and what its use means or conveys in a particular context (or even in general). (pp. 2-3)

However, this appearance of co-operative reconciliation – that at least some kind of semantics-pragmatics interaction will provide a complete theory of language – is to a certain extent merely a façade of orthodoxy, which obscures somewhat more radical underlying views. A spectrum of positions now runs between radical extremes of how much of what we want to call ‘meaning’ is determined by semantics, and how much by pragmatics. The argument can roughly be described as a difference as to the degree of independence (from pragmatics) that we can ascribe to linguistic meaning. Some are of the view that at least a core of semantic content remains untouched by pragmatic effects. Others hold that all semantic content is ‘pragmatically saturated’. These positions carry on the legacies of Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophies respectively – now known as variations on ‘Literalism’ and ‘Contextualism’. (See Recanati 2004 for a clarifying description of the various views that now compose the debate.) The former position has also pitched itself as a semantic ‘minimalism’ or ‘invariantism’ (compare Cappelen and Lepore 2005; Borg 2004). Contextualism, the view that has its origins in Ordinary Language philosophy, has support from, for example, Recanati (2004) and Travis (who argues for the ‘occasion-sensitivity’ of meaning, see his 1996). Supporters of the notion of the context (or use)-sensitivity of meaning object to Grice’s original argument: that we really can cleave a distinctly semantic content from all other aspects of language use. Contextualists argue that it is difficult, perhaps impossible, to isolate a purely semantic core, untouched by pragmatic influences, for example a ‘literal’ meaning (compare Searle 1979; Recanati 2004).

Nevertheless, there have been highly successful efforts at devising theories which treat of many of the phenomena assumed to be pragmatic, but which nevertheless have been shown to have inextricably semantic effects. Examples of such phenomena include, for example, indexicality, quantifier domain restriction, seemingly relative or ‘scalar’ terms such as ‘tall’, ‘rich’ and so on. The theories in question aim at showing that such phenomena are after all perfectly formalizable aspects of a classical semantic account, and not merely pragmatic effects on meaning (a classic example of such work is to be found in Stanley and Gendler Szabo 2000 and King and Stanley 2005). Along these lines, the philosophy of language is well on its way (again) toward being based on a ‘systematic’ theory of meaning. Nevertheless, the ‘Homeric struggle’ Strawson described (2004, pp. 132) between two fundamentally opposing views about linguistic meaning continues.


7. References and Further Reading

a. Analysis and Formal Logic

  • Beaney, Michael. (Ed.). 1997. The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Dummett, Michael. 1981 [1973]. Frege: Philosophy of Language. London: Duckworth.
  • Dummett, Michael. 1997 [1993]. The Seas of Language. London: Oxford University Press.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1879]. “Begriffsschrift: Selections (Preface and Part I).” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 47-78.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1918]. “Thought.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 325-345.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1891]. “Function and Concept.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 130-148.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1892]. “On Sinn and Bedeutung.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 151-171.
  • Ramsey, Frank P. 1959 [1931]. “Philosophy.” In A. J. Ayer, ed., Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press, 321-326.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1949 [1905]. “On Denoting.” In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 103-119.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1910. “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 11, 108-128.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1914. Our Knowledge of the External World. La Salle: Open Court.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1995 [1921]. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, trans., D. F. Pears. London: Routledge.

b. Logical Atomism

  • Ayer, Alfred Jules. 1940. The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge. London: Macmillan.
  • Pears, David. 1972. Russell’s Logical Atomism. Illinois: Fontana Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1918-1919. “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism.” The Monist 28, 495-527; 29, 32-63, 190-222, 345-380.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1959 [1924]. “Logical Atomism.” In A. J. Ayer, ed., Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press, 31-50.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1927. The Analysis of Matter. London: George Allen and Unwin.

c. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language

  • Ayer, Alfred Jules. (Ed.). 1959. Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press.
    • A collection of seminal papers in Logical Positivism.
  • Bergmann, Gustav. 1992 [1953]. “Logical Positivism, Language, and the Reconstruction of Metaphysics.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 63-71.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1949. Truth and confirmation. In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 119-127.
    • Discusses the Ideal/Ordinary Language philosophical differences in detail.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1992 [1934]. “On the Character of Philosophic Problems.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 54-62.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1937. The Logical Syntax of Language, trans., A. Smeaton. London: Routledge.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1992 [1950]. “Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 72-84.
  • Coffa, J. Alberto. 1991. The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Feigl, Herbert and Sellars, Wilfrid. (Eds.). 1949. Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts.
    • A collection of early papers in Logical Positivism.
  • Feigl, Herbert. 1949 [1943]. “Logical Empiricism.” In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 3-26.
  • Rorty, Richard. 1992 [1967]. “Introduction.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1-39.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur. 1997 [1963]. The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap. LaSalle: Open Court.
  • Schlick, Moritz. 1992 [1932]. “The Future of Philosophy.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 43-53.

d. Early Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Ambrose, Alice. 1950. “The Problem of Linguistic Inadequacy.” In M. Black, ed., Philosophical Analysis. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 15-37.
  • Ambrose, Alice and Lazerowitz, Morris. 1985. Necessity and Language. London: Croom Helm.
  • Black, Max. (Ed.). 1950. Philosophical Analysis. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall.
  • Black, Max. (Ed.). 1954. Problems of Analysis. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Chappell, Vere Claiborne. (Ed.). 1964. Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall.
    • Basic collection of essential Ordinary Language philosophical classics.
  • Caton, Charles Edwin. (Ed.). 1963. Philosophy and Ordinary Language. Urbana: University of Illinois Press.
  • Farrell, Brian. (1946a). An appraisal of therapeutic positivism I. Mind 55, 25-48.
  • Farrell, Brian. (1946b). An appraisal of therapeutic positivism II. Mind 55, 133-150.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1951. Logic and Language. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1953. Logic and Language, 2nd Series. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1956. Essays in Conceptual Analysis. London: Macmillan.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1964 [1942a]. “Moore and Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 5-23.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1942b. “Certainty and Empirical Statements.” Mind 52, 18-36.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1940. “Are Necessary Propositions Really Verbal?” Mind 69, 189-203.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1949. “Defending Common Sense.” Philosophical Review 58, 201- 220.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1951. “Philosophy for Philosophers.” Philosophical Review 60, 329-340.
  • Rorty, Richard. (Ed.). 1992 [1967]. The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
    • A unique and seminal collection of essays on both the Ordinary Language and the Ideal Language views. Rorty’s introductions are well worth reading for their insightful comments on the issues involved. Has an enormous and comprehensive cross-referenced bibliography on the literature.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1992 [1931]. “Systematically Misleading Expressions.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 85-100.
  • Wisdom, John. 1936. “Philosophical Perplexity.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 37, 71-88.
  • Wisdom, John. 1953. Philosophy and Psycho-Analysis. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1965 [1958]. The Blue and Brown Books. New York: Harper and Row.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1994 [1953]. Philosophical Investigations, trans., G. E. M. Anscombe. Oxford: Blackwell.

e. The Paradigm Case Argument

  • Flew, Antony. 1957. “Farewell to the Paradigm-Case Argument: A Comment.” Analysis 18, 34-40.
  • Hanfling, Oswald. 1990. “What is Wrong with the paradigm-Case Argument?” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 99, 21-37.
  • Richman, Robert J. 1961. “On the Argument of the Paradigm Case.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 39, 75-81.
  • Watkins, John William Nevill. 1957. “Farewell to the Paradigm-Case Argument.” Analysis 18, 25-33.

f. Oxford Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1962. How to Do Things With Words. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1964 [1956]. “A Plea for Excuses.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 41-63.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1962. Sense and Sensibilia, ed., G. J. Warnock. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1979. Philosophical Papers, eds., J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cavell, Stanley. 1964 [1958]. “Must We Mean What We Say?” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 75-112.
  • Henson, Richard. 1965. “What We Say.” American Philosophical Quarterly 2, 52-62.
  • McDowell, John. 1994. Mind and World. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1949. The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchinson.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1964 [1953]. “Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 24-40.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1963 [1957]. “The Theory of Meaning.” In C. Caton, ed., Philosophy and Ordinary Language. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 128-153.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1961. “Use, Usage and Meaning.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volumes 35, 223-230.
  • Searle, John. (Ed.). 1971. The Philosophy of Language. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Collection of essays on the Oxford Ordinary Language approach.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick and Grice, Herbert Paul. 1956. “In Defence of a Dogma.” Philosophical Review 65, 141-158.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1950. “On Referring.” Mind 59, 320-344.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1959. Individuals: An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics. London: Methuen.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1952. Introduction to Logical Theory. London: Methuen.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 2004 [1971]. Logico-Linguistic Papers. Aldershot: Ashgate.

g. Criticism of Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Campbell, Chares Arthur. 1944. “Commonsense Propositions and Philosophical Paradoxes.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 45, 1-25.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1992 [1951]. “Philosophers and Ordinary Language.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 175-182.
  • Devitt, Michael and Sterelny, Kim. 1999. Language and Reality: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Language, 2nd ed. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Fodor, Jerry and Katz, Jerrold J. 1971 [1963]. “The Availability of What We Say.” In C. Lyas, ed., Philosophy and Linguistics. London: Macmillan, 190-203.
  • Grice Herbert Paul. 1989. Studies in the Way of Words. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Gellner, Ernest André. 1959. Words and Things: A Critical Account of Linguistic Philosophy and a Study in Ideology. London: Gollancz.
    • A hyperbolic criticism of linguistic philosophies.
  • Lewis, Hywel David. (Ed.). 1963. Clarity is not Enough: Essays in Criticism of Linguistic Philosophy. London: George Allen and Unwin.
    • Early collection of critical essays.
  • Mates, Benson. 1964 [1958]. “On the Verification of Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 64-74.
  • Rollins, Calvin Dwight. 1951. “Ordinary Language and Procrustean Beds.” Mind 60, 223-232.
  • Tennessen, Herman. 1965. “Ordinary Language in Memoriam.” Inquiry 8, 225-248.
  • Weitz, Morris. 1947. “Philosophy and the Abuse of Language.” Journal of Philosophy 44, 533-546.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2007. The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Woozley, Anthony Douglas. 1953. “Ordinary Language and Common Sense.” Mind 62, 301-312.

h. Contemporary views

  • Borg, Emma. 2004. Minimal Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Pro-truth-conditional, invariant semantics for linguistic meaning.
  • Cappelen, Herman and Lepore, Ernie. 2005. Insensitive Semantics: A Defense of Semantic Minimalism and Speech Act Pluralism. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Pro-truth-conditional, invariant semantics for linguistic meaning.
  • Gendler Szabó, Zoltán. (Ed.). 2005. Semantics versus Pragmatics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Excellent collection of essays targeting the Minimalist/Contextualist debate about linguistic meaning.
  • Hale, Bob and Wright, Crispin. (Eds.). 1997. A Companion to the Philosophy of Language. London: Routledge.
    • Good anthology of relevant essays.
  • King, Jeffrey and Stanley, Jason. 2005. “Semantics, Pragmatics and the Role of Semantic Content.” In Z. Gendler Szabó, ed., Semantics versus Pragmatics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 111-164.
  • Lycan, William. 1999. The Philosophy of Language: A Contemporary Introduction. New York: Routledge.
  • Recanati, Francois. 2004. Literal Meaning. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Thorough discussion of the Minimalist/Contextualist debate, supportive of a moderately Contextualist view about linguistic meaning.
  • Searle, John. 1969. Speech Acts. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Searle, John. 1979 [1978]. “Literal Meaning.” In J. Searle, ed., Expression and Meaning. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 117-136.
  • Stanley, Jason and Gendler Szabó, Zoltán. 2000. “On Quantifier Domain Restriction.” Mind and Language 15, 219-261.
  • Travis, Charles. 1996. “Meaning’s Role in Truth.” Mind 100, 451-466.
    • A ‘radical’ Contextualist, and anti-Minimalist about linguistic meaning.
  • Travis, Charles. 1999. “Pragmatics.” In B. Hale and C. Wright, eds., A Companion to the Philosophy of Language. London: Routledge, 87-107.

i. Historical and Other Commentaries

  • Hacker, Peter Michael Stephan. 1996. Wittgenstein’s Place in Twentieth-Century Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Thorough historical account of early analytic philosophy, including detailed biographical information on philosophers – for example, who worked with whom, and who was whose pupils/teachers. Reads easily, as a first-hand account.
  • Hanfling, Oswald. (2000). Philosophy and Ordinary Language: The Bent and Genius of Our Tongue. London: Routledge.
    • One of the only modern defenses of Ordinary Language philosophy.
  • Klibansky, Raymond. (Ed.). 1958. Philosophy in the Mid-Century, Volume 2. Florence: La Nuova Italia.
  • Lyas, Colin. (Ed.). 1971. Philosophy and Linguistics. London: Macmillan.
    • Addresses the debate regarding ‘what we say’, and some Oxford Ordinary Language philosophical disputes.
  • Passmore, John Arthur. 1957. “Wittgenstein and Ordinary Language Philosophy.” In J. A. Passmore, A Hundred Years of Philosophy. London: Duckworth.
    • An early account of Ordinary Language philosophy, at a time when it was still in vogue.
  • Quinton, Anthony. 1958. “Linguistic Analysis.” In R. Klibansky, ed., Philosophy in the Mid-Century, Volume 2. Florence: La Nuova Italia.
    • Excellent bibliography.
  • Soames, Scott. 2003. Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century, Volume 2: The Age of Meaning. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Urmson, James Opie. 1956. Philosophical Analysis: Its Development Between the Two World Wars. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey James. (Ed.). 1960. The Revolution in Philosophy. London: Macmillan.


Author Information

Sally Parker-Ryan
U. S. A.

Berlin Circle

ReichenbachThe Berlin Circle was a group of philosophers and scientists who gathered round Hans Reichenbach in late 1920s. Among its other members, were K. Grelling, C. G. Hempel, D. Hilbert, R. von Mises. The Berlin Circle's name was Die Gesellschaft für Empirische Philosophie (Society for Empirical Philosophy). It  joined up with the Vienna Circle; together they published the journal Erkenntnis that was edited by both Rudolf Carnap and Hans Reichenbach, and they organized several congresses on scientific philosophy, the first of which was held in Prague in 1929.

Members of the Berlin Circle were particularly active in analyzing contemporary physics, especially the theory of relativity, and in developing the frequency interpretation of probability. After the rise of Nazism, several members of the Berlin Circle emigrated from Germany. Reichenbach moved to Turkey in 1933 and then to the USA in 1938; Hempel to Belgium in 1934 and to the USA in 1939; Grelling was killed in a concentration camp. Hence the Berlin Circle was dispersed.

Author Information

Mauro Murzi

The IEP is actively seeking a replacement article of 4,000 or more words.

Carl Gustav Hempel (1905—1997)

Carl Hempel, a German-born philosopher who immigrated to the United States, was one of the prominent philosophers of science in the twentieth century. His paradox of the ravens—as an illustration of the paradoxes of confirmation—has been a constant challenge for theories of confirmation. Together with Paul Oppenheim, he proposed a quantitative account of degrees of confirmation of hypotheses by evidence. His deductive-nomological model of scientific explanation put explanations on the same logical footing as predictions; they are both deductive arguments. The difference is a matter of pragmatics, namely that in an explanation the argument’s conclusion is intended to be assumed true whereas in a prediction the intention is make a convincing case for the conclusion. Hempel also proposed a quantitative measure of the power of a theory to systematize its data.Later in his life, Hempel abandoned the project of an inductive logic. He also emphasized the problems with logical positivism (logical empiricism), especially those concerning the verifiability criterion. Hempel eventually turned away from the logical positivists’ analysis of science to a more empirical analysis in terms of the sociology of science.

Hempel studied mathematics, physics, and philosophy in Gottingen, Heidelberg, Vienna, and Berlin. In Vienna, he attended some of the meetings of the Vienna Circle. With the help of Rudolf Carnap , he managed to leave Europe before the Second World War, and he came to Chicago on a research grant secured by Carnap. He later taught at the City University of New York, Yale University and Princeton University.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Scientific Explanation
  3. Paradoxes of Confirmation
  4. Concept Formation in Empirical Science
  5. The Late Hempel
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life

One of the leading members of logical positivism, he was born in Oranienburg, Germany, in 1905. Between March 17 and 24, 1982, Hempel gave an interview to Richard Nolan; the text of that interview was published for the first time in 1988 in Italian translation (Hempel, "Autobiografia intellettuale" in Oltre il positivismo logico, Armando: Rome, Italy, 1988). This interview is the main source of the following biographical notes.

Hempel studied at the Realgymnasium at Berlin and, in 1923, he was admitted at the University of Gottingen where he studied mathematics with David Hilbert and Edmund Landau and symbolic logic with Heinrich Behmann. Hempel was very impressed with Hilbert’s program of proving the consistency of mathematics by means of elementary methods; he also studied philosophy, but he found mathematical logic more interesting than traditional logic. The same year he moved to the University of Heidelberg, where he studied mathematics, physics, and philosophy. From 1924, Hempel studied at Berlin, where he met Reichenbach who introduced him to the Berlin Circle. Hempel attended Reichenbach’s courses on mathematical logic, the philosophy of space and time, and the theory of probability. He studied physics with Max Planck and logic with von Neumann.

In 1929, Hempel took part in the first congress on scientific philosophy organized by logical positivists. He meet Carnap and—very impressed by Carnap—moved to Vienna where he attended three courses with Carnap, Schlick, and Waismann, and took part in the meetings of the Vienna Circle. In the same years, Hempel qualified as teacher in the secondary school and eventually, in 1934, he gained the doctorate in philosophy at Berlin, with a dissertation on the theory of probability. In the same year, he immigrated to Belgium, with the help of a friend of Reichenbach, Paul Oppenheim (Reichenbach introduced Hempel to Oppenheim in 1930). Two years later, Hempel and Oppenheim published the book Der Typusbegriff im Lichte der neuen Logik on the logical theory of classifier, comparative and metric scientific concepts.

In 1937, Hempel was invited—with the help of Carnap—to the University of Chicago as Research Associate in Philosophy. After another brief period in Belgium, Hempel immigrated to the United States in 1939. He taught in New York, at City College (1939-1940) and at Queens College (1940-1948). In those years, he was interested in the theory of confirmation and explanation, and published several articles on that subject: "A Purely Syntactical Definition of Confirmation," in The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 8, 1943; "Studies in the Logic of Confirmation" in Mind, 54, 1945; "A Definition of Degree of Confirmation" (with P. Oppenheim) in Philosophy of Science, 12, 1945; "A Note on the Paradoxes of Confirmation" in Mind, 55, 1946; "Studies in the Logic of Explanation" (with P. Oppenheim) in Philosophy of Science, 15, 1948.

Between 1948 and 1955, Hempel taught at Yale University. His work Fundamentals of Concept Formation in Empirical Science was published in 1952 in the International Encyclopedia of Unified Science. From 1955, he taught at the University of Princeton. Aspects of Scientific Explanation and Philosophy of Natural Science were published in 1965 and 1966 respectively. After the pensionable age, he continued teaching at Berkley, Irvine, Jerusalem, and, from 1976 to 1985, at Pittsburgh. In the meantime, his philosophical perspective was changing and he detached from logical positivism: "The Meaning of Theoretical Terms: A Critique of the Standard Empiricist Construal" in Logic, Methodology and Philosophy of Science IV (ed. by Patrick Suppes), 1973; "Valuation and Objectivity in Science" in Physics, Philosophy and Psychoanalysis (ed. by R. S. Cohen and L. Laudan), 1983; "Provisoes: A Problem Concerning the Inferential Function of Scientific Theories" in Erkenntnis, 28, 1988. However, he remained affectionately joined to logical positivism. In 1975, he undertook the editorship (with W. Stegmüller and W. K. Essler) of the new series of the journal Erkenntnis. Hempel died November 9, 1997, in Princeton Township, New Jersey.

2. Scientific Explanation

Hempel and Oppenheim’s essay "Studies in the Logic of Explanation," published in volume 15 of the journal Philosophy of Science, gave an account of the deductive-nomological explanation. A scientific explanation of a fact is a deduction of a statement (called the explanandum) that describes the fact we want to explain; the premises (called the explanans) are scientific laws and suitable initial conditions. For an explanation to be acceptable, the explanans must be true.

According to the deductive-nomological model, the explanation of a fact is thus reduced to a logical relationship between statements: the explanandum is a consequence of the explanans. This is a common method in the philosophy of logical positivism. Pragmatic aspects of explanation are not taken into consideration. Another feature is that an explanation requires scientific laws; facts are explained when they are subsumed under laws. So the question arises about the nature of a scientific law. According to Hempel and Oppenheim, a fundamental theory is defined as a true statement whose quantifiers are not removable (that is, a fundamental theory is not equivalent to a statement without quantifiers), and which do not contain individual constants. Every generalized statement which is a logical consequence of a fundamental theory is a derived theory. The underlying idea for this definition is that a scientific theory deals with general properties expressed by universal statements. References to specific space-time regions or to individual things are not allowed. For example, Newton’s laws are true for all bodies in every time and in every space. But there are laws (e.g., the original Kepler laws) that are valid under limited conditions and refer to specific objects, like the Sun and its planets. Therefore, there is a distinction between a fundamental theory, which is universal without restrictions, and a derived theory that can contain a reference to individual objects. Note that it is required that theories are true; implicitly, this means that scientific laws are not tools to make predictions, but they are genuine statements that describe the world—a realistic point of view.

There is another intriguing characteristic of the Hempel-Oppenheim model, which is that explanation and prediction have exactly the same logical structure: an explanation can be used to forecast and a forecast is a valid explanation. Finally, the deductive-nomological model accounts also for the explanation of laws; in that case, the explanandum is a scientific law and can be proved with the help of other scientific laws.

Aspects of Scientific Explanation, published in 1965, faces the problem of inductive explanation, in which the explanans include statistical laws. According to Hempel, in such kind of explanation the explanans give only a high degree of probability to the explanandum, which is not a logical consequence of the premises. The following is a very simple example.

The relative frequency of P with respect to Q is r
The object a belongs to P
Thus, a belongs to Q

The conclusion "a belongs to Q" is not certain, for it is not a logical consequence of the two premises. According to Hempel, this explanation gives a degree of probability r to the conclusion. Note that the inductive explanation requires a covering law: the fact is explained by means of scientific laws. But now the laws are not deterministic; statistical laws are admissible. However, in many respects the inductive explanation is similar to the deductive explanation.

  • Both deductive and inductive explanation are nomological ones (that is, they require universal laws).
  • The relevant fact is the logical relation between explanans and explanandum: in deductive explanation, the latter is a logical consequence of the former, whereas in inductive explanation, the relationship is an inductive one. But in either model, only logical aspects are relevant; pragmatic features are not taken in account.
  • The symmetry between explanation and prediction is preserved.
  • The explanans must be true.

3. Paradoxes of Confirmation

During his research on confirmation, Hempel formulated the so-called paradoxes of confirmation. Hempel’s paradoxes are a straightforward consequence of the following apparently harmless principles:

  • The statement (x)(Rx → Bx) is supported by the statement (Ra & Ba)
  • If P1 and P2 are logically equivalent statements and O1 confirms P1, then O1 also supports P2.

Hence, (~Ra & ~Ba), which confirms (x)(~Bx → ~Rx), also supports (x)(Rx → Bx). Now suppose Rx means "x is a raven" and Bx means "x is black." Therefore, "a isn't a raven and isn't black" confirms "all ravens are black." That is, the observation of a red fish supports the hypothesis that all ravens are black.

Note also that the statement (x)((~Rx ∨ Rx) → (~Rx ∨ Bx)) is equivalent to (x)(Rx → Bx). Thus, (~Ra ∨ Ba) supports "all ravens are black" and hence the observation of whatever thing which is not a raven (tennis-ball, paper, elephant, red herring) supports "all ravens are black."

4. Concept Formation in Empirical Science

In his monograph Fundamentals of Concept Formation in Empirical Science (1952), Hempel describes the methods according to which physical quantities are defined. Hempel uses the example of the measurement of mass.

An equal-armed balance is used to determine when two bodies have the same mass and when the mass of a body is greater than the mass of the other. Two bodies have the same mass if, when they are on the pans, the balance remains in equilibrium. If a pan goes down and the other up, then the body in the lowest pan has a greater mass. From a logical point of view, this procedure defines two relations, say E and G, so that:

  • E(a,b) if and only if a and b have the same mass;
  • G(a,b) if and only if the mass of a is greater that the mass of b.

The relations E and G satisfy the following conditions:

  1. E is a reflexive, symmetric and transitive relation.
  2. G is an irreflexive, asymmetric and transitive relation.
  3. E and G are mutually exclusive—that is, if E(a,b), then not G(a,b).
  4. For every a and b, one and only one of the following assertions is true:
E(a,b) G(a,b) G(b,a)

Relations E and G thus define a partial order.

The second step consists in defining a function m which satisfies the following three conditions:

  1. A suitable prototype is chosen, whose mass is one kilogram.
  2. If E(a,b) then m(a)=m(b).
  3. There is an operation, say ©, which combines two bodies a and b, so that

    m(a © b) = m(a) + m(b)

Conditions (1)-(7) describe the measurement not only of mass but also of length, of time and of every extensive physical quantity. (A quantity is extensive if there is an operation which combines the objects according to condition 7, otherwise it is intensive; temperature, for example, is intensive.)

5. The Late Hempel

In "The Meaning of Theoretical Terms" (1973), Hempel criticizes an aspect of logical positivism’s theory of science: the distinction between observational and theoretical terms and the related problem about the meaning of theoretical terms. According to Hempel, there is an implicit assumption in neopositivist analysis of science, namely that the meaning of theoretical terms can be explained by means of linguistic methods. Therefore, the very problem is how can a set of statements be determined that gives a meaning to theoretical terms. Hempel analyzes the various theories proposed by logical positivism.

According to Schlick, the meaning of theoretical concepts is determined by the axioms of the theory; the axioms thus play the role of implicit definitions. Therefore, theoretical terms must be interpreted in a way that makes the theory true. But according to such interpretation—Hempel objects—a scientific theory is always true, for it is true by convention, and thus every scientific theory is a priori true. This is a proof—Hempel says—that Schlick’s interpretation of the meaning of theoretical terms is not tenable. Also the thesis which asserts that the meaning of a theoretical term depends on the theory in which that term is used is, according to Hempel, untenable.

Another solution to the problem of the meaning of theoretical terms is based on the rules of correspondence (also known as meaning postulates). They are statements in which observational and theoretical terms occur. Theoretical terms thus gain a partial interpretation by means of observational terms. Hempel raises two objections to this theory. First, he asserts that observational concepts do not exist. When a scientific theory introduces new theoretical terms, they are linked with other old theoretical terms that usually belong to another already consolidated scientific theory. Therefore, the interpretation of new theoretical terms is not based on observational terms but it is given by other theoretical terms that, in a sense, are more familiar than the new ones. The second objection is about the conventional nature of rules of correspondence. A meaning postulate defines the meaning of a concept and therefore, from a logical point of view, it must be true. But every statement in a scientific theory is falsifiable, and thus there is no scientific statement which is beyond the jurisdiction of experience. So, a meaning postulate can be false as well; hence, it is not conventional and thus it does not define the meaning of a concept but it is a genuine physical hypothesis. Meaning postulates do not exist.

"Provisoes: A Problem concerning the Inferential Function of Scientific Theories," published in Erkenntnis (1988), criticizes another aspect of logical positivism’s theory of science: the deductive nature of scientific theories. It is very interesting that a philosopher who is famous for his deductive model of scientific explanation criticized the deductive model of science. At least this fact shows the open views of Hempel. He argues that it is impossible to derive observational statements from a scientific theory. For example, Newton’s theory of gravitation cannot determine the position of planets, even if the initial conditions are known, for Newton’s theory deals with the gravitational force, and thus the theory cannot forecast the influences exerted by other kinds of force. In other words, Newton’s theory requires an explicit assumption—a provisoe, according to Hempel—which assures that the planets are subjected only to the gravitational force. Without such hypothesis, it is impossible to apply the theory to the study of planetary motion. But this assumption does not belong to the theory. Therefore, the position of planets is not determined by the theory, but it is implied by the theory plus appropriate assumptions. Accordingly, not only observational statements are not entailed by the theory, but also there are no deductive links between observational statements. Hence, it is impossible that an observational statement is a logical consequence of a theory (unless the statement is logically true). This fact has very important consequences.

One of them is that the empirical content of a theory does not exist. Neopositivists defined it as the class of observational statements implied by the theory; but this class is an empty set.

Another consequence is that theoretical terms are not removable from a scientific theory. Known methods employed to accomplish this task assert that, for every theory T, it is possible to find a theory T* without theoretical terms so that an observational statement O is a consequence of T* if and only if it is a consequence of T. Thus, it is possible to eliminate theoretical terms from T without loss of deductive power. But—Hempel argues—no observational statement O is derivable from T, so that T* lacks empirical consequence.

Suppose T is a falsifiable theory; therefore, there is an observational statement O so that ~O → ~T. Hence, T → ~O; so T entails an observational statement ~O. But no observational statement is a consequence of T. Thus, the theory T is not falsifiable. The consequence is that every theory is not falsifiable. (Note: Hempel’s argument is evidently wrong, for according to Popper the negation of an observational statement usually is not an observational statement).

Finally, the interpretation of science due to instrumentalism is not tenable. According to such interpretation, scientific theories are rules of inference, that is, they are prescriptions according to which observational statements are derived. Hempel’s analysis shows that these alleged rules of inference are indeed void.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Essler, W. K., Putnam, H., & Stegmuller, W. (Eds.). (1985). Epistemology, Methodology, and Philosophy of Science: Essays in Honour of Carl G. Hempel on the Occasion of his 80th Birthday, January 8th, 1985. Dordrecht, Holland: D. Reidel Pub. Co.
  • Hempel, C. G. (1934). Beitrage zur logischen analyse des wahrscheinlichkeitsbegriffs. Universitats-buchdruckerei G. Neuenhahn, Jena.
  • Hempel, C. G. (1937). "Le problème de la vérité." Theoria, 3.
  • Hempel, C. G. (1942). "The Function of General Laws in Hystory." The Journal of Philosophy, 39.
  • Hempel, C. G. (1943). "A Purely Syntactical Definition of Confirmation." The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 8.
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Author Information

Mauro Murzi

Russell's Metaphysics

russellMetaphysics is not a school or tradition but rather a sub-discipline within philosophy, as are ethics, logic and epistemology. Like many philosophical terms, “metaphysics” can be understood in a variety of ways, so any discussion of Bertrand Russell’s metaphysics must select from among the various possible ways of understanding the notion, for example, as the study of being qua being, the study of the first principles or grounds of being, the study of God, and so forth. The primary sense of “metaphysics” examined here in connection to Russell is the study of the ultimate nature and constituents of reality.

Since what we know, if anything, is assumed to be real, doctrines in metaphysics typically dovetail with doctrines in epistemology. But in this article, discussion of Russell’s epistemology is kept to a minimum in order to better canvas his metaphysics, beginning with his earliest adult views in 1897 and ending shortly before his death in 1970. Russell revises his conception of the nature of reality in both large and small ways throughout his career. Still, there are positions that he never abandons; particularly, the belief that reality is knowable, that it is many, that there are entities – universals – that do not exist in space and time, and that there are truths that cannot be known by direct experience or inference but are known a priori.

The word “metaphysics” sometimes is used to describe questions or doctrines that are a priori, that is, that purport to concern what transcends experience, and particularly sense-experience. Thus, a system may be called metaphysical if it contains doctrines, such as claims about the nature of the good or the nature of human reason, whose truth is supposed to be known independently of (sense) experience. Such claims have characterized philosophy from its beginnings, as has the belief that they are meaningful and valuable. However, from the modern period on, and especially in Russell’s own lifetime, various schools of philosophy began to deny the legitimacy and desirability of a priori metaphysical theorizing. In fact, Russell’s life begins in a period sympathetic to this traditional philosophical project, and ends in a period which is not. Concerning these “meta-metaphysical” issues (that is, doctrines not in metaphysics but about it and its feasibility), Russell remained emphatically a metaphysician throughout his life. In fact, in his later work, it is this strand more than doctrines about the nature of reality per se that justify his being considered as one of the last, great metaphysicians.

Table of Contents

  1. The 1890s: Idealism
    1. Neo-Hegelianism
    2. F. H. Bradley and Internal Relations
    3. Neo-Kantianism and A Priori Knowledge
    4. Russell’s Turn from Idealism to Realism
      1. His Rejection of Psychologism
      2. His Rejection of Internal Relations
  2. 1901-1904: Platonist Realism
    1. What has Being
    2. Propositions as Objects
    3. Analysis and Classes
    4. Concepts’ Dual Role in Propositions
    5. Meaning versus Denoting
    6. The Relation of Logic to Epistemology and Psychology
  3. 1905-1912: Logical Realism
    1. Acquaintance and Descriptive Psychology
    2. Eliminating Classes as Objects
      1. “On Denoting” (1905)
      2. Impact on Analysis
    3. Eliminating Propositions as Objects
    4. Facts versus Complexes
    5. Universals and Particulars
    6. Logic as the Study of Forms of Complexes and Facts
    7. Sense Data and the Problem of Matter
  4. 1913-1918: Occam’s Razor and Logical Atomism
    1. The Nature of Logic
    2. The Nature of Matter
    3. Logical Atomism
      1. The Atoms of Experience and the Misleading Nature of Language
      2. The Forms of Facts and Theory of Truth
      3. Belief as a New Form of Fact
      4. Neutral Monism
  5. 1919-1927: Neutral Monism, Science, and Language
    1. Mind, Matter, and Meaning
    2. Private versus Public Data
    3. Language, Facts, and Psychology
    4. Universals
    5. The Syntactical View
  6. 1930-1970: Anti-positivist Naturalism
    1. Logical Truths
    2. Empirical Truths
    3. A Priori Principles
    4. Universals
    5. The Study of Language
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Monographs
      2. Collections of Essays
      3. Articles
      4. The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell
      5. Autobiographies and Letters
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. General Surveys
      2. History of Analytic Philosophy
      3. Logic and Metaphysics
      4. Meaning and Metaphysics
      5. Beliefs and Facts
      6. Constructions
      7. Logical Atomism
      8. Naturalism and Psychology
      9. Biographies

1. The 1890s: Idealism

Russell’s earliest work in metaphysics is marked by the sympathies of his teachers and his era for a particular tradition known as idealism. Idealism is broadly understood as the contention that ultimate reality is immaterial or dependent on mind, so that matter is in some sense derivative, emergent, and at best conditionally real. Idealism flourished in Britain in the last third of the nineteenth century and first two decades of the twentieth. British idealists such as Bernard Bosanquet, T.H. Green, Harold Joachim, J.M.E. McTaggart and F.H. Bradley – some of whom were Russell’s teachers – were most influenced by Hegel’s form of absolute idealism, though influences of Immanuel Kant’s transcendental idealism can also be found in their work. This section will explore British Idealism’s influence on the young Bertrand Russell.

a. Neo-Hegelianism

Until 1898, Russell’s work a variety of subjects (like geometry or space and time) is marked by the presumption that any area of study contains contradictions that move the mind into other, related, areas that enrich and complete it. This is similar to Hegel’s dialectical framework. However, in Hegel’s work this so-called “dialectic” is a central part of his metaphysical worldview, characterizing the movement of “absolute spirit” as it unfolds into history. Russell is relatively uninfluenced by Hegel’s broader theory, and adopts merely the general dialectical approach. He argues, for example, that the sciences are incomplete and contain contradictions, that one passes over into the other, as number into geometry and geometry into physics. The goal of a system of the sciences, he thinks, is to reveal the basic postulates of each science, their relations to each other, and to eliminate all inconsistencies but those that are integral to the science as such. (“Note on the Logic of the Sciences,” Papers 2) In this way, Russell’s early work is dialectical and holistic rather than monistic. On this point, Russell’s thinking was probably influenced by his tutors John McTaggart and James Ward, who were both British idealists unsympathetic to Bradley’s monism.

b. F. H. Bradley and Internal Relations

Bradley, most famous for his book Appearance and Reality, defines what is ultimately real as what is wholly unconditioned or independent. Put another way, on Bradley’s view what is real must be complete and self-sufficient. Bradley also thinks that the relations a thing stands in, such as being to the left of something else, are internal to it, that is, grounded in its intrinsic properties, and therefore inseparable from those properties. It follows from these two views that the subjects of relations, considered in themselves, are incomplete and dependent, and therefore ultimately unreal. For instance, if my bookcase is to the left of my desk, and if the relation being to the left of is internal to my bookcase, then being to the left of my desk contributes to the identity or being of my bookcase just as being six feet tall and being brown do. Consequently, it is not unconditioned or independent, since its identity is bound up with my desk’s. Since the truly real is independent, it follows that my bookcase is not truly real. This sort of argument can be given for every object that we could conceivably encounter in experience: everything stands in some relation or other to something else, thus everything is partially dependent on something else for its identity; but since it is dependent, it is not truly real.

The only thing truly real, Bradley thinks, is the whole network of interrelated objects that constitutes what we might call “the whole world.” Thus he embraces a species of monism: the doctrine that, despite appearances to the contrary, no plurality of substances exists and that only one thing exits: the whole. What prevents us from apprehending this, he believes, is our tendency to confuse the limited reality of things in our experience (and the truths based on that limited perspective)- with the unconditioned reality of the whole, the Absolute or One. Hence, Bradley is unsympathetic to the activity of analysis, for by breaking wholes into parts it disguises rather than reveals the nature of reality.

The early Russell, who was familiar with Bradley’s work through his teachers at Cambridge, was only partly sympathetic to F. H. Bradley’s views. Russell accepts the doctrine that relations are internal but, unlike Bradley, he does not deny that there is a plurality of things or subjects. Thus Russell’s holism, for example, his view of the interconnectedness of the sciences, does not require the denial of plurality or the rejection of analysis as a falsification of reality, both of which doctrines are antithetic to him early on.

c. Neo-Kantianism and A Priori Knowledge

Russell’s early views are also influenced by Kant. Kant argued that the mind imposes categories (like being in space and time) that shape what we experience. Since Kant defines a priori propositions as those we know to be true independently of (logically prior to) experience, and a posteriori propositions as those whose truth we know only through experience, it follows that propositions about these categories are a priori, since the conditions of any possible experience must be independent of experience. Thus for Kant, geometry contains a priori propositions about categories of space that condition our experience of things as spatial.

Russell largely agrees with Kant in his 1898 Foundations of Geometry, which is based on his dissertation. Other indications of a Kantian approach can be seen, for example, in his 1897 claim that what is essential to matter is schematization under the form of space (“On Matter,” Papers 2).

d. Russell’s Turn from Idealism to Realism

There are several points on which Russell’s views eventually turn against idealism and towards realism. The transition is not sudden but gradual, growing out of discomfort with what he comes to see as an undue psychologism in his work, and out of growing awareness of the importance of asymmetrical (ordering) relations in mathematics. The first issue concerns knowledge and opposes neo-Kantianism; the second issue concerns the nature of relations and the validity of analysis and opposes Neo-Hegelianism and Monism. The former lends itself to realism and mind/matter dualism, that is, to a view of matter as independent of minds, which apprehend it without shaping it. The latter lends itself to a view of the radical plurality of what exists. Both contribute to a marked preference for analysis over synthesis, as the mind’s way of apprehending the basic constituents of reality. By the time these developments are complete, Russell’s work no longer refers to the dialectic of thought or to the form of space or to other marks of his early infatuation with idealism. Yet throughout Russell’s life there remains a desire to give a complete account of the sciences, as a kind of vestige of his earlier views.

i. His Rejection of Psychologism

When Russell begins to question idealism, he does so in part because of the idealist perspective on the status of truths of mathematics. In his first completely anti-idealist work, The Principles of Mathematics (1903), Russell does not reject Kant’s general conception of the distinction between a priori and a posteriori knowledge, but he rejects Kant’s idealism, that is, Kant’s doctrine that the nature of thought determines what is a priori. On Russell’s view, human nature could change, and those truths would then be destroyed, which he thinks is absurd. Moreover, Russell objects that the Kantian notion of a priori truth is conditional, that is, that Kant must hold that 2 + 2 equals 4 only on condition that the mind always thinks it so (Principles, p. 40.) On Russell’s view, in contrast, mathematical and logical truths must be true unconditionally; thus 2 + 2 equals 4 even if there are no intelligences or minds. Thus Russell’s attack on Kant’s notion of the a priori focuses on what he sees as Kant’s psychologism, that is, his tendency to confuse what is objectively true even if no one thinks it, with what we are so psychologically constructed as to have to think. In general, Russell begins to sharply distinguish questions of logic, conceived as closely related to metaphysics, from questions of knowledge and psychology. Thus in his 1904 paper “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions” (Essays in Analysis, pp. 21-22), he writes, “The theory of knowledge is often regarded as identical with logic. This view results from confounding psychical states with their objects; for, when it is admitted that the proposition known is not the identical with the knowledge of it, it becomes plain that the question as to the nature of propositions is distinct from all questions of knowledge…. The theory of knowledge is in fact distinct from psychology, but is more complex: for it involves not only what psychology has to say about belief, but also the distinction of truth and falsehood, since knowledge is only belief in what is true.”

ii. His Rejection of Internal Relations

In his early defense of pluralism, external relations ( relations which cannot be reduced to properties) play an important role. The monist asserts that all relations within a complex or whole are less real than that whole, so that analysis of a whole into its parts is a misrepresentation or falsification of reality, which is one. It is consonant with this view, Russell argues, to try to reduce propositions that express relations to propositions asserting a property of something, that is, some subject-term (Principles, p. 221.) The monist therefore denies or ignores the existence of relations. But some relations must be irreducible to properties of terms, in particular the transitive and asymmetrical relations that order series, as the quality of imposing order among terms is lost if the relation is reduced to a property of a term. In rejecting monism, Russell argues that at least some relations are irreducible to properties of terms, hence they are external to those terms (Principles, p. 224); and on the basis of this doctrine of external relations, he describes reality as not one but many, that is, composed of diverse entities, bound but not dissolved into wholes by external relations. Since monism tends to reduce relations to properties, and to take these as intrinsic to substances (and ultimately to only one substance), Russell’s emphasis on external relations is explicitly anti-monistic.

2. 1901-1904: Platonist Realism

When Russell rebelled against idealism (with his friend G.E. Moore) he adopted metaphysical doctrines that were realist and dualist as well as Platonist and pluralist. As noted above, his realism and dualism entails that there is an external reality distinct from the inner mental reality of ideas and perceptions, repudiating the idealist belief that ultimate reality consists of ideas and the materialist view that everything is matter, and his pluralism consists in assuming there are many entities bound by external relations. Equally important, however, is his Platonism.

a. What has Being

Russell’s Platonism involves a belief that there are mind-independent entities that need not exist to be real, that is, to subsist and have being. Entities, or what has being (and may or may not exist) are called terms, and terms include anything that can be thought. In Principles of Mathematics (1903) he therefore writes, “Whatever may be an object of thought,…, or can be counted as one, I call a term. …I shall use it as synonymous with the words unit, individual, and entity. … [E]very term has being, that is, is in some sense. A man, a moment, a number, a class, a relation, a chimera, or anything else that can be mentioned, is sure to be a term….” (Principles, p. 43) Russell links his metaphysical Platonism to a theory of meaning as well as a theory of knowledge. Thus, all words that possess meaning do so by denoting complex or simple, abstract or concrete objects, which we apprehend by a kind of knowledge called acquaintance.

b. Propositions as Objects

Since for Russell words mean objects (terms), and since sentences are built up out of several words, it follows that what a sentence means, a proposition, is also an entity -- a unity of those entities meant by the words in the sentence, namely, things (particulars, or those entities denoted by names) and concepts (entities denoted by words other than names). Propositions are thus complex objects that either exist and are true or subsist and are false. So, both true and false propositions have being (Principles, p. 35). A proposition is about the things it contains; for example, the proposition meant by the sentence “the cat is on the mat” is composed of and is about the cat, the mat, and the concept on. As Russell writes to Gottlob Frege in 1904: ‘I believe that in spite of all of its snowfields Mount Blanc itself is a component part of what is actually asserted in the proposition “Mount Blanc is more than 40,000 meters high.” We do not assert the thought, for that is a private psychological matter; we assert the object of the thought, and this is, to my mind, a certain complex (an objective proposition, one might say) in which Mount Blanc is itself a component part.’ (From Frege to Gödel, pp. 124-125)

This Platonist view of propositions as objects bears, furthermore, on Russell’s conception of logical propositions. In terms of the degree of abstractness in the entities making them up, the propositions of logic and those of a particular science sit at different points on a spectrum, with logical propositions representing the point of maximum generality and abstraction (Principles, p. 7). Thus, logical propositions are not different in kind from propositions of other sciences, and by a process of analysis we can come to their basic constituents, the objects (constants) of logic.

c. Analysis and Classes

Russell sometimes compares philosophical analysis to a kind of mental chemistry, since, as in chemical analysis, it involves resolving complexes into their simpler elements (Principles, p. xv). But in philosophical analyses, the process of decomposing a complex is entirely intellectual, a matter of seeing with the mind’s eye the simples involved in some complex concept. To have reached the end of such an intellectual analysis is to have reached the simple entities that cannot be further analyzed but must be immediately perceived. Reaching the end of an analysis – that is, arriving at the mental perception of a simple entity, a concept – then provides the means for definition, in the philosophical sense, since the meaning of the term being analyzed is defined in terms of the simple entities grasped at the end of the process of analysis. Yet in this period Russell is confronted with several logical and metaphysical problems. We see from his admission in the Principles that he has been unable to grasp the concept class which, he sees, leads to contradictions, for example, to Russell’s paradox (Principles, pp. xv-xvi).

Russell’s extreme Platonist realism involves him in several difficulties besides the fact that class appears to be a paradoxical (unthinkable) entity or concept. These additional concerns, which he sees even in the Principles, along with his difficulty handling the notion of a class and the paradoxes surrounding it, help determine the course of his later metaphysical (and logical) doctrines.

d. Concepts’ Dual Role in Propositions

One difficulty concerns the status of concepts within the entity called a proposition, and this arises from his doctrine that any quality or absence of quality presupposes being. On Russell’s view the difference between a concept occurring as such and occurring as a subject term in a proposition is merely a matter of their external relations and not an intrinsic or essential difference in entities (Principles, p. 46). Hence a concept can occur either predicatively or as a subject term. He therefore views with suspicion Frege’s doctrine that concepts are essentially predicative and cannot occur as objects, that is, as the subject terms of a proposition (Principles, Appendix A). As Frege acknowledges, to say that concepts cannot occur as objects is a doctrine that defies exact expression, for we cannot say “a concept is not an object” without seemingly treating a concept as an object, since it appears to be the referent of the subject term in our sentence. Frege shows little distress over this problem of inexpressibility, but for Russell such a state of affairs is self-contradictory and paradoxical since the concept is an object in any sentence that says it is not. Yet, as he discovers, to allow concepts a dual role opens the way to other contradictions (such as Russell’s paradox), since makes it possible for a predicate to be predicated of itself. Faced with paradoxes on either side, Russell chooses to risk the paradox he initially sees as arising from Frege’s distinction between concepts and objects in order to avoid more serious logical paradoxes arising from his own assumption of concepts’ dual role. (See Principles, Chapter X and Appendix B.) This issue contributes to his emerging attempt to eliminate problematic concepts and propositions from the domain of what has being. In doing so he implicitly draws away from his original belief that what is thinkable has being, as it is not clear how he can say that items he earlier entertained are unthinkable.

e. Meaning versus Denoting

Another difficulty with Russell’s Platonist realism concerns the way concepts are said to contribute to the meaning of propositions in which they occur. As noted earlier, propositions are supposed to contain what they are about, but the situation is more complex when these constituent entities include denoting concepts, either indefinite ones like a man or definite ones like the last man. The word “human” denotes an extra-mental concept human, but the concept human denotes the set of humans: Adam, Benjamin, Cain, and so on. As a result, denoting concepts have a peculiar role in objective propositions: when a denoting phrase occurs in a sentence, a denoting concept occurs in the corresponding proposition, but the proposition is not about the denoting concept but about the entities falling under the concept. Thus the proposition corresponding to the sentence “all humans are mortal” contains the concept human but is not about the concept per se – it is not attributing mortality to a concept - but is about individual humans. As a result, it is difficult to see how we can ever talk about the concept itself (as in the sentence “human is a concept”), for when we attempt to do so what we denote is not what we mean. In unpublished work from the period immediately following the publication of Principles (for example, “On Fundamentals,” Papers 4) Russell struggles to explain the connection between meaning and denoting, which he insists is a logical and not a merely psychological or linguistic connection.

f. The Relation of Logic to Epistemology and Psychology

In his early work, Russell treats logical questions quite like metaphysical ones and as distinct from epistemological and psychological issues bearing on how we know. As we saw (in section 1.d.i above), in his 1904 “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions” (Papers 4), Russell objects to what he sees as the idealist tendency to equate epistemology (that is, theory of knowledge) with logic, the study of propositions, by wrongly identifying states of knowing with the objects of those states (for example, judging with what is judged, the proposition). We must, he says, clearly distinguish a proposition from our knowledge of a proposition, and in this way it becomes clear that the study of the nature of a proposition, which falls within logic, in no sense involves the study of knowledge. Epistemology is also distinct from and more inclusive than psychology, for in studying knowledge we need to look at psychological phenomena like belief, but since “knowledge” refers not merely to belief but to true belief, the study of knowledge involves investigation into the distinction between true and false and in that way goes farther than psychology.

3. 1905-1912: Logical Realism

Even as these problems are emerging, Russell is becoming acquainted with Alexius Meinong’s psychologically oriented philosophical concerns. At the same time, he is adopting an eliminative approach towards classes and other putative entities by means of a logical analysis of sentences containing words that appear to refer to such entities. These forces together shape much of his metaphysics in this early period. By 1912, these changes have resulted in a metaphysic preoccupied with the nature and forms of facts and complexes.

a. Acquaintance and Descriptive Psychology

Russell becomes aware of the work of Alexius Meinong, an Austrian philosopher who studied with Franz Brentano and founded a school of experimental psychology. Meinong’s most famous work, Über Gegenstandstheorie (1904), or Theory of Objects, develops the concept of intentionality, that is, the idea that consciousness is always of objects, arguing, further, that non-existent as well as existent objects lay claim to a kind of being – a view to which Russell is already sympathetic. Russell’s 1904 essay “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions” (Papers 4) illustrates his growing fascination with descriptive psychology, which brings questions concerning the nature of cognition to the foreground. After 1904, Russell’s doctrine of the constituents of propositions is increasingly allied to epistemological and psychological investigations. For example, he begins to specify various kinds of acquaintance - sensed objects, abstract objects, introspected ones, logical ones, and so forth. Out of this discourse comes the more familiar terminology of universals and particulars absent from his Principles.

b. Eliminating Classes as Objects

Classes, as Russell discovers, give rise to contradictions, and their presence among the basic entities assumed by his logical system therefore impedes the goal, sketched in the Principles, of showing mathematics to be a branch of logic. The general idea of eliminating classes predates the discovery of the techniques enabling him to do so, and it is not until 1905, in “On Denoting,” that Russell discovers how to analyze sentences containing denoting phrases so as to deny that he is committed to the existence of corresponding entities. It is this general technique that he then employs to show that classes need not be assumed to exist, since sentences appearing to refer to classes can be rewritten in terms of properties.

i. “On Denoting” (1905)

For Russell in 1903, the meaning of a word is an entity, and the meaning of a sentence is therefore a complex entity (the proposition) composed of the entities that are the meanings of the words in the sentence. (See Principles, Chapter IV.) The words and phrases appearing in a sentence (like the words “I” and “met” and “man” in “I met a man”) are assumed to be those that have meaning (that is, that denote entities). In “On Denoting” (1905) Russell attempts to solve the problem of how indefinite and definite descriptive phrases like “a man” and “the present King of France,” which denote no single entities, have meaning. From this point on, Russell begins to believe that a process of logical analysis is necessary to locate the words and phrases that really give the sentence meaning and that these may be different than the words and phrases that appear at first glance to comprise the sentence. Despite advocating a deeper analysis of sentences and acknowledging that the words that contribute to their meaning may not be those that superficially appear in the sentence, Russell continues to believe (even after 1905), that a word of phrase has meaning only by denoting an entity.

ii. Impact on Analysis

This has a marked impact on his conception of analysis, which makes it a kind of discovery of entities. Thus Russell sometimes means by “analysis” a process of devising new ways of conveying what a particular word or phrase means, thereby eliminating the need for the original word. Sometimes the result of this kind of analysis or construction is to show that there can be no successful analysis in the first sense with respect to a particular purported entity. It is not uncommon for Russell to employ both kinds of analysis in the same work. This discovery, interwoven with his attempts to eliminate classes, emerges as a tactic that eventually eliminates a great many of the entities he admitted in 1903.

c. Eliminating Propositions as Objects

In 1903, Russell believed subsistence and existence were modalities of those objects called propositions. By 1906, Russell’s attempt to eliminate propositions testifies to his movement away from this view of propositions. (See “On the Nature of Truth, Proc. Arist. Soc., 1906, pp. 28-49.) Russell is already aware in 1903 that his conception of propositions as single (complex) entities is amenable to contradictions. In 1906, his worries about propositions and paradox lead him to reject objective false propositions, that is, false subsisting propositions that have being as much as true ones.

In seeking to eliminate propositions Russell is influenced by his success in “On Denoting,” as well as by Meinong. As he adopts the latter’s epistemological and psychological interests, he becomes interested in cognitive acts of believing, supposing, and so on, which in 1905 he already calls ‘propositional attitudes’ (“Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions,” Papers 4) and which he hopes can be used to replace his doctrine of objective propositions. He therefore experiments with ways of eliminating propositions as single entities by accounting for them in terms of psychological acts of judgment that give unity to the various parts of the proposition, drawing them together into a meaningful whole. Yet the attempts do not go far, and the elimination of propositions only becomes official with the theory of belief he espouses in 1910 in “On the Nature of Truth and Falsehood” (Papers 6), which eliminates propositions and explains the meaning of sentences in terms of a person’s belief that various objects are unified in a fact.

d. Facts versus Complexes

By 1910 the emergence of the so-called multiple relation theory of belief brings the notion of a fact into the foreground. On this theory, a belief is true if things are related in fact as they are in the judgment, and false if they are not so related.

In this period, though Russell sometimes asks whether a complex is indeed the same as a fact (for example, in the 1913 unpublished manuscript Theory of Knowledge (Papers 7, p. 79)), he does not yet draw the sharp distinction between them that he later does in the 1918 lectures published as the Philosophy of Logical Atomism (Papers 8), and they are treated as interchangeable. That is, no distinction is yet drawn between what we perceive (a complex object, such as the shining sun) and what it is that makes a judgment based on perception true (a fact, such as that the sun is shining). He does, however, distinguish between a complex and a simple object (Principia, p. 44). A simple object is irreducible, while a complex object can be analyzed into other complex or simple constituents. Every complex contains one or more particulars and at least one universal, typically a relation, with the simplest kind of complex being a dyadic relation between two terms, as when this amber patch is to the right of that brown patch. Both complexes and facts are classified into various forms of increasing complication.

e. Universals and Particulars

In this period, largely through Meinong’s influence, Russell also begins to distinguish types of acquaintance – the acquaintance we have with particulars, with universals, and so on. He also begins to relinquish the idea of possible or subsisting particulars (for example, propositions), confining that notion to universals.

The 1911 “On the Relations of Universals and Particulars” (Papers 6) presents a full-blown doctrine of universals. Here Russell argues for the existence of diverse particulars – that is, things like tables, chairs, and the material particles that make them up that can exist in one and only one place at any given time. But he also argues for the existence of universals, that is, entities like redness that exist in more than one place at any time. Having argued that properties are universals, he cannot rely on properties to individuate particulars, since it is possible for there to be multiple particulars with all the same properties. In order to ground the numerical diversity of particulars even in cases where they share properties, Russell relies on spatial location. It is place or location, not any difference in properties, that most fundamentally distinguishes any two particulars.

Finally, he argues that our perceived space consists of asymmetrical relations such as left and right, that is, relations that order space. As he sees it, universals alone can’t account for the asymmetrical relations given in perception – particulars are needed. Hence, wherever a spatial relation holds, it must hold of numerically diverse terms, that is, of diverse particulars. Of course, there is also need for universals, since numerically diverse particulars cannot explain what is common to several particulars, that is, what occurs in more than one place.

f. Logic as the Study of Forms of Complexes and Facts

Though he eliminates propositions, Russell continues to view logic in a metaphysically realist way, treating its propositions as objects of a particularly formal, abstract kind. Since Russell thinks that logic must deal with what is objective, but he now denies that propositions are entities, he has come to view logic as the study of forms of complexes. The notion of the form of a complex is linked with the concept of substituting certain entities for others in a complex so as to arrive at a different complex of the same form. Since there can be no such substitution of entities when the complex doesn’t exist, Russell struggles to define the notions of form and substitution in a complex in a way that doesn’t rule out the existence of forms in cases of non-existent complexes. Russell raises this issue in a short manuscript called “What is Logic?” written in September and October of 1912 (Papers 6, pp. 54-56). After considering and rejecting various solutions Russell admits his inability to solve difficulties having to do with forms of non-existent complexes, but this and related difficulties plague his analysis of belief, that is, the analysis given to avoid commitment to objective false propositions.

g. Sense Data and the Problem of Matter

An interest in questions of what we can know about the world – about objects or matter – is a theme that begins to color Russell’s work by the end of this period. In 1912 Russell asks whether there is anything that is beyond doubt (Problems of Philosophy, p. 7). His investigation implies a particular view of what exists, based on what it is we can believe with greatest certainty.

Acknowledging that visible properties, like color, are variable from person to person as well as within one person’s experience and are a function of light’s interaction with our visual apparatus (eyes, and so forth), Russell concludes that we do not directly experience what we would normally describe as colored – or more broadly, visible – objects. Rather, we infer the existence of such objects from what we are directly acquainted with, namely, our sense experiences. The same holds for other sense-modalities, and the sorts of objects that we would normally describe as audible, scented, and so forth. For instance, in seeing and smelling a flower, we are not directly acquainted with a flower, but with the sense-data of color, shape, aroma, and so on. These sense-data are what are immediately and certainly known in sensation, while material objects (like the flower) that we normally think of as producing these experiences via the properties they bear (color, shape, aroma) are merely inferred.

These epistemological doctrines have latent metaphysical implications: because they are inferred rather than known directly, ordinary sense objects (like flowers) have the status of hypothetical or theoretical entities, and therefore may not exist. And since many ordinary sense objects are material, this calls the nature and existence of matter into question. Like Berkeley, Russell thinks it is possible that what we call “the material world” may be constructed out of elements of experience – not ideas, as Berkeley thought, but sense-data. That is, sense-data may be the ultimate reality. However, although Russell thought this was possible, he did not at this time embrace such a view. Instead, he continued to think of material objects as real, but as known only indirectly, via inferences from sense-data. This type of view is sometimes called “indirect realism.”

Although Russell is at this point willing to doubt the existence of physical objects and replace them with inferences from sense-data, he is unwilling to doubt the existence of universals, since even sense-data seem to have sharable properties. For instance, in Problems, he argues that, aside from sense data and inferred physical objects, there must also be qualities and relations (that is, universals), since in “I am in my room,” the word “in” has meaning and denotes something real, namely, a relation between me and my room (Problems, p. 80). Thus he concludes that knowledge involves acquaintance with universals.

4. 1913-1918: Occam’s Razor and Logical Atomism

In 1911 Ludwig Wittgenstein, a wealthy young Austrian, came to study logic with Russell, evidently at Frege’s urging. Russell quickly came to regard his student as a peer, and the two became friends (although their friendship did not last long). During this period, Wittgenstein came to disagree with Russell’s views on logic, meaning, and metaphysics, and began to develop his own alternatives. Surprisingly, Russell became convinced that Wittgenstein was correct both in his criticisms and in his alternative views. Consequently, during the period in question, Wittgenstein had considerable impact on the formation of Russell’s thought.

Besides Wittgenstein, another influence in this period was A.N. Whitehead, Russell’s collaborator on the Principia Mathematica, which is finally completed during this period after many years’ work.

The main strands of Russell’s development in this period concern the nature of logic and the nature of matter or physical reality. His work in and after 1914 is parsimonious about what exists while remaining wedded to metaphysical realism and Platonism. By the end of this period Russell has combined these strands in a metaphysical position called logical atomism.

a. The Nature of Logic

By 1913 the nature of form is prominent in Russell’s discussion of logical propositions, alongside his discussion of forms of facts. Russell describes logical propositions as constituted by nothing but form, saying in Theory of Knowledge that they do not have forms but are forms, that is, abstract entities (Papers 7, p. 98). He says in the same period that the study of philosophical logic is in great part the study of such forms. Under Ludwig Wittgenstein’s influence, Russell begins to conceive of the relations of metaphysics to logic, epistemology and psychology in a new way. Thus in the Theory of Knowledge (as revised in 1914) Russell admits that any sentence of belief must have a different logical form from any he has hitherto examined (Papers 7, p. 46), and, since he thinks that logic examines forms, he concludes, contra his earlier view (in “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions,” Papers 4), that the study of forms can’t be kept wholly separate from the theory of knowledge or from psychology.

In Our Knowledge of the External World (1914) the nature of logic plays a muted role, in large part because of Russell’s difficulties with the nature of propositions and the forms of non-existent complexes and facts. Russell argues that logic has two branches: mathematical and philosophical (Our Knowledge, pp. 49-52; 67). Mathematical logic contains completely general and a priori axioms and theorems as well as definitions such as the definition of number and the techniques of construction used, for example, in his theory of descriptions. Philosophical logic, which Russell sometimes simply calls logic, consists of the study of forms of propositions and the facts corresponding to them. The term 'philosophical logic' does not mean merely a study of grammar or a meta-level study of a logical language; rather, Russell has in mind the metaphysical and ontological examination of what there is. He further argues, following Wittgenstein, that belief facts are unlike other forms of facts in so far as they contain propositions as components (Our Knowledge, p, 63).

b. The Nature of Matter

In 1914 -1915, Russell rejects the indirect realism that he had embraced in 1912. He now sees material objects as constructed out of, rather than inferred from, sense-data. Crediting Alfred North Whitehead for his turn to this “method of construction,” in Our Knowledge of the External World (1914) and various related papers Russell shows how the language of logic can be used to interpret material objects in terms of classes of sense-data like colors or sounds. Even though we begin with something ultimately private - sense-data viewed from the space of our unique perspective - it is possible to relate that to the perspective of other observers or potential observers and to arrive at a class of classes of sense data. These “logical constructions” can be shown to have all the properties supposed to belong to the objects of which they are constructions. And by Occam’s Razor - the principle not to multiply entities unnecessarily - whenever it is possible to create a construction of an object with all the properties of the object, it is unnecessary to assume the existence of the object itself. Thus Russell equates his maxim “wherever possible, to substitute constructions for inferences” (“On the Relation of Sense Data to Physics, Papers 8) with Occam’s razor.

c. Logical Atomism

In the 1918 lectures published as Philosophy of Logical Atomism (Papers 8) Russell describes his philosophical views as a kind of logical atomism, as the view that reality consists of a great many ultimate constituents or ‘atoms’. In describing his position as “logical” atomism, he understands logic in the sense of “philosophical logic” rather than “technical logic,” that is, as an attempt to arrive through reason at what must be the ultimate constituents and forms constituting reality. Since it is by a process of a priori philosophical analysis that we reach the ultimate constituents of reality – sense data and universals – such constituents might equally have been called “philosophical” atoms: they are the entities we reach in thought when we consider what sorts of things must make up the world. Yet Russell’s metaphysical views are not determined solely a priori. They are constrained by science in so far as he believes he must take into account the best available scientific knowledge, as demonstrated in his attempt to show the relation between sense-data and the “space, time and matter” of physics (Our Knowledge, p. 10).

i. The Atoms of Experience and the Misleading Nature of Language

Russell believed that we cannot move directly from the words making up sentences to metaphysical views about which things or relations exist, for not all words and phrases really denote entities. It is only after the process of analysis that we can decide which words really denote things and thus, which things really exist. Analysis shows that many purported denoting phrases – such as words for ordinary objects like tables and chairs – can be replaced by logical constructions that, used in sentences, play the role of these words but denote other entities, such as sense-data (like patches of color) and universals, which can be included among the things that really exist.

Regarding linguistics, Russell believed that analysis results in a logically perfect language consisting only of words that denote the data of immediate experience (sense data and universals) and logical constants, that is, words like “or” and “not” (Papers 8, p. 176).

ii. The Forms of Facts and Theory of Truth

These objects (that is, logical constructions) in their relations or with their qualities constitute the various forms of facts. Assuming that what makes a sentence true is a fact, what sorts of facts must exist to explain the truth of the kinds of sentences there are? In 1918, Russell answers this question by accounting for the truth of several different kinds of sentences: atomic and molecular sentences, general sentences, and those expressing propositional attitudes like belief.

So-called atomic sentences like “Andrew is taller than Bob” contain two names (Andrew, Bob) and one symbol for a relation (is taller than). When true, an atomic sentence corresponds to an atomic fact containing two particulars and one universal (the relation).

Molecular sentences join atomic sentences into what are often called “compound sentences” by using words like “and” or “or.” When true, molecular sentences do not correspond to a single conjunctive or disjunctive fact, but to multiple atomic facts (Papers 8, pp. 185-86). Thus, we can account for the truth of molecular propositions like “Andrew is kind or he is young” simply in terms of the atomic facts (if any) corresponding to “Andrew is kind” and “Andrew is young,” and the meaning of the word “or.” It follows that “or” is not a name for a thing, and Russell denies the existence of molecular facts.

Yet to account for negation (for example, “Andrew is not kind”) Russell thinks that we require more than just atomic facts. We require negative facts; for if there were no negative facts, there would be nothing to verify a negative sentence and falsify its opposite, the corresponding positive atomic sentence (Papers 8, pp. 187-90).

Moreover, no list of atomic facts can tell us that it is all the facts; to convey the information expressed by sentences like “everything fair is good” requires the existence of general facts.

iii. Belief as a New Form of Fact

Russell describes Wittgenstein as having persuaded him that a belief fact is a new form of fact, belonging to a different series of facts than the series of atomic, molecular, and general facts. Russell acknowledges that belief-sentences pose a difficulty for his attempt (following Wittgenstein) to explain how the truth of the atomic sentences fully determines the truth or falsity of all other types of sentences, and he therefore considers the possibility of explaining-away belief facts. Though he concedes that expressions of propositional attitudes, that is, sentences of the form “Andrew believes that Carole loves Bob,” might, by adopting a behaviorist analysis of belief, be explained without the need of belief facts (Papers 8, pp. 191-96), he stops short of that analysis and accepts beliefs as facts containing at least two relations (in the example, belief and loves).

iv. Neutral Monism

By 1918, Russell is conscious that his arguments for mind/matter dualism and against neutral monism are open to dispute. Neutral monism opposes both materialism (the doctrine that what exists is material) and British and Kantian idealism (the doctrine that only thought or mind is ultimately real), arguing that reality is more fundamental than the categories of mind (or consciousness) and matter, and that these are simply names we give to one and the same neutral reality. The proponents of neutral monism include John Dewey and William James (who are sometimes referred to as American Realists), and Ernst Mach. Given the early Russell’s commitment to mind/matter dualism, neutral monism is to him at first alien and incredible. Still, he admits being drawn to the ontological simplicity it allows, which fits neatly with his preference for constructions over inferences and his increasing respect for Occam’s razor, the principle of not positing unnecessary entities in one’s ontology (Papers 8, p. 195).

5. 1919-1927: Neutral Monism, Science, and Language

During this period, Russell’s interests shift increasingly to questions belonging to the philosophy of science, particularly to questions about the kind of language necessary for a complete description of the world. Many distinct strands feed into Russell’s thought in this period.

First, in 1919 he finally breaks away from his longstanding dualism and shifts to a kind of neutral monism. This is the view that what we call “mental” and what we call “material” are really at bottom the same “stuff,” which is neither mental nor material but neutral. By entering into classes and series of classes in different ways, neutral stuff gives rise to what we mistakenly think of distinct categories, the mental and the material (Analysis of Mind, p. 105).

Second, Russell rather idiosyncratically interweaves his new monist ideas with elements of behaviorism, especially in advancing a view of language that moves some of what he formerly took to be abstract entities into the domain of stimuli or events studied by psychology and physiology. In neither case is his allegiance complete or unqualified. For example, he rejects a fully behaviorist account of language by accepting that meaning is grounded in mental images available to introspection but not to external observation. Clearly, this is incompatible with behaviorism. Moreover, this seems to commit Russell to intrinsically mental particulars. This would stand in opposition to neutral monism, which denies there are any intrinsically mental (or physical) particulars. (See Analysis of Mind, Lecture X.)

Third, he begins in this same period to accept Ludwig Wittgenstein’s conception (in the Tractatus Logico Philosophicus) of logical propositions as tautologies that say nothing about the world.

Though these developments give Russell’s work the appearance of a retreat from metaphysical realism, his conception of language and logic remains rooted in realist, metaphysical assumptions.

a. Mind, Matter, and Meaning

Because of his neutral monism, Russell can no longer maintain the distinction between a mental sensation and a material sense-datum, which was crucial to his earlier constructive work. Constructions are now carried out in terms that do not suppose mind and matter (sensations and sense-data) to be ultimately distinct. Consciousness is no longer seen as a relation between something psychical, a subject of consciousness, and something physical, a sense datum (Analysis of Mind, pp. 142-43). Instead, the so-called mental and so-called physical dimensions are both constructed out of classes of classes of perceived events, between which there exist – or may exist – correlations.

Meaning receives a similar treatment: instead of a conception of minds in a relation to things that are the meanings of words, Russell describes meaning in terms of classes of events stimulated or caused by certain other events (Analysis of Mind, Chapter X). Assertions that a complex exists hereafter reduce to assertions of some fact about classes, namely that the constituents of classes are related in a certain way.

His constructions also become more complex to accommodate Einstein’s theory of relativity. This work is carried out in particular both in his 1921 Analysis of Mind, which is occupied in part with explaining mind and consciousness in non-mental terms, and in his 1927 Analysis of Matter, which returns to the analysis of so-called material objects, that in 1914 were constructed out of classes of sense-data.

b. Private versus Public Data

Despite his monism, Russell continues to distinguish psychological and physical laws (“On Propositions,” Papers 8, p. 289), but this dualist element is mitigated by his belief that whether an experience exists in and obeys the laws of physical space is a matter of degree. Some sensations are localized in space to a very high degree, others are less so, and some aren’t at all. For example, when we have an idea of forming the word “orange” in our mouth, our throat constricts just a tiny bit as if to mouth, “orange.” In this case there exists no clear distinction between the image we have of words in the mouth and our mouth-and-lip sensations (Papers 8, p. 286). Depending on your choice of context the sensation can be labeled either mental or material.

Moreover, tactile images of words in the mouth do not violate the laws of physics when seen as material events located in the body, specifically, in the mouth or jaw. In contrast, visual images have no location in a body; for instance, the image of your friend seated in a chair is located neither in your mouth, jaw, nor anywhere else in your body. Moreover, many visual images cannot be construed as bodily sensations, as images of words can, since, no relevant physical event corresponding to the visual image occurs. His admission that visual images are always configured under psychological laws seems to commit Russell to a doctrine of mental particulars. For this reason, Russell appears not so much to adopt neutral monism, which rejects such entities, as to adapt it to his purposes.

c. Language, Facts, and Psychology

Immediately after the lectures conclude, while in prison writing up notes eventually published in the 1921 Analysis of Mind (Papers 8, p. 247), Russell introduces a distinction between what a proposition expresses and what it asserts or states. Among the things that are expressed in sentences are logical concepts, words like “not” and “or,” which derive meaning from psychological experiences of rejection and choice. In these notes and later writings, belief is explained in terms of having experiences like these about image propositions (Analysis of Mind, p. 251). Thus what we believe when we believe a true negative proposition is explained psychologically as a state of disbelief towards a positive image proposition (Analysis of Mind, p. 276). Despite this analysis of the meaning of words for negation, Russell continues to think that negative facts account for what a negative belief asserts, that is, for what makes it true. The psychological account doesn’t do away with the need for them, Russell explains, because the truth or falsity of a proposition is due to some fact, not to a subjective belief or state.

d. Universals

Russell continues to analyze truth in terms of relation to facts, and to characterize facts as atomic, negative, and so on. Moreover, he continues to assume that we can talk about the constituents of facts in terms of particulars and universals. He does not abandon his belief that there are universals; indeed, in the 1920s he argues that we have no images of universals but can intend or will that an image, which is always a particular, ‘mean’ a universal (“On Propositions,” Papers 8, p. 293). This approach is opposed by those like Frank P. Ramsey, for whom notions like “atomic fact” are analogous to “spoken word”: they index language rather than reality. For Ramsey - and others in the various emerging schools of philosophy for which metaphysics is anathema - Russell’s approach confuses categories about language with categories of things in the world and in doing so is too metaphysical and too realist.

e. The Syntactical View

To some extent, Russell accepts the syntactical view in the following sense. Beginning in 1918 he concedes that logical truths are not about the world but are merely tautologies, and he comes to admit that tautologies are nothing more than empty combinations of meaningless symbols. Yet Russell’s conception of language and logic remains in some respects deeply metaphysical. For example, when, following Ramsey’s suggestion, Russell claims in the 1925 second edition of Principia that a propositional function occurs only in the propositions that are its values (Principia, p. xiv and Appendix C), he again aligns that idea with a doctrine of predicates as incomplete symbols, that is, with a metaphysical doctrine of the distinction between universals and particulars. Opposing this, Ramsey praises what he thinks is Wittgenstein’s deliberate attempt to avoid metaphysical characterizations of the ultimate constituents of facts, a view he infers from Wittgenstein’s cryptic remark in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus that, in a fact, objects “hang together” like links in a chain.

6. 1930-1970: Anti-positivist Naturalism

The choice of years framing this final category is somewhat artificial since Russell’s work retains a great deal of unity with the doctrines laid down in the 1920s. Nevertheless, there is a shift in tone, largely due to the emergence of logical positivism, that is, the views proposed by the members of the Vienna Circle. Russell’s work in the remaining decades of his life must be understood as metaphysical in orientation and aim, however highly scientific in language, and as shaped in opposition to doctrines emanating from logical positivism and the legacy following Ludwig Wittgenstein’s claim that philosophical (metaphysical) propositions are nonsensical pseudo-propositions. Yet even as it remains metaphysical in orientation, with respect to logic Russell’s work continues to draw back from his early realism.

a. Logical Truths

In his 1931 introduction to second edition of Principles of Mathematics, Russell writes that, “logical constants…must be treated as part of the language, not as part of what the language speaks about,” adopting a view that he admits is “more linguistic than I believed to be at the time I wrote the Principles” (Principles, p. xi) and that is “less Platonic, or less realist in the medieval sense of the word” (Principles, p. xiv). At the same time he says that he was too generous when he first wrote the Principles in saying that a proposition belongs to logic or mathematics if it contains nothing but logical constants (understood as entities), for he now concedes there are extra-logical propositions (for example “there are three things”) that can be posed in purely logical terms. Moreover, though he now thinks that (i) logic is distinguished by the tautological nature of its propositions, and (ii) following Rudolf Carnap he explains tautologies in terms of analytic propositions, that is, those that are true in virtue of form, Russell notes that we have no clear definition of what it is to be true in virtue of form, and hence no clear idea of what is distinctive to logic (Principles, p. xii). Yet, in general, he no longer thinks of logical propositions as completely general truths about the world, related to those of the special sciences, albeit more abstract.

b. Empirical Truths

In his later work, Russell continues to believe that, when a proposition is false, it is so because of a fact. Thus against logical positivists like Neurath, he insists that when empirical propositions are true, “true” has a different meaning than it does for propositions of logic. It is this assumption that he feels is undermined by logical positivists like Carnap, Neurath and others who treat language as socially constructed, and as isolable from facts. But this is wrong, he thinks, as language consists of propositional facts that relate to other facts and is therefore not merely constructed. It is this he has in mind, when in the 1936 “Limits of Empiricism” (Papers 10), he argues that Carnap and Wittgenstein present a view that is too syntactical; that is, truth is not merely syntactical, nor a matter of propositions cohering. As a consequence, despite admitting that his view of logic is less realist, less metaphysical, than in the past, Russell is unwilling to adopt metaphysical agnosticism, and he continues to think that the categories in language point beyond language to the nature of what exists.

c. A Priori Principles

Against logical positivism, Russell thinks that to defend the very possibility of objective knowledge it is necessary to permit knowledge to rest in part on non-empirical propositions. In Inquiry into Meaning and Truth (1940) and Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits (1948) Russell views the claim that all knowledge is derived from experience as self-refuting and hence inadequate to a theory of knowledge: as David Hume showed, empiricism uses principles of reason that cannot be proved by experience. Specifically, inductive reasoning about experience presupposes that the future will resemble the past, but this belief or principle cannot similarly be proved by induction from experience without incurring a vicious circle. Russell is therefore willing to accept induction as involving a non-empirical logical principle, since, without it, science is impossible. He thus continues to hold that there are general principles, comprised of universals, which we know a priori. Russell affirms the existence of general non-empirical propositions on the grounds, for example, that the incompatibility of red/blue is neither logical nor a generalization from experience (Inquiry, p. 82). Finally, against the logical positivists, Russell rejects the verificationist principle that propositions are true or false only if they are verifiable, and he rejects the idea that propositions make sense only if they are empirically verifiable.

d. Universals

Though Russell’s late period work is empiricist in holding that experience is the ultimate basis of knowledge, it remains rationalist in that some general propositions must be known independently of experience, and realist with respect to universals. Russell argues for the existence of universals against what he sees as an overly syntactical view that eliminates them as entities. That is, he asserts that (some) relations are non-linguistic. Universals figure in Russell’s ontology, in his so-called bundle theory, which explains thing as bundles of co-existing properties, rejecting the notion of a substance as an unknowable ‘this’ distinct from and underlying its properties. (See Inquiry, Chapter 6.) The substance-property conception is natural, he says, if sentences like “this is red” are treated as consisting of a subject and a predicate. However, in sentences like "redness is here," Russell treats the word "redness" as a name rather than as a predicate. On the substance-property view, two substances may have all their properties in common and yet be distinct, but this possibility vanishes on the bundle theory since a thing is its properties. Aside from his ontology, Russell’s reasons for maintaining the existence of universals are largely epistemological. We may be able to eliminate a great many supposed universals, but at least one, such as is similar, will remain necessary for a full account of our perception and knowledge (Inquiry, p. 344). Russell uses this notion to show that it is unnecessary to assume the existence of negative facts, which until the 1940s he thought necessary to explain truth and falsity. For several decades his psychological account of negative propositions as a state of rejection towards some positive proposition coexisted with his account, using negative facts, of what justifies saying that a negative belief is true and a positive one is false. Thus Russell does not eliminate negative facts until 1948 in Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits, where one of his goals is to explain how observation can determine the truth of a negative proposition like “this is not blue” and the falsity of a positive one like “this is blue” without being committed to negative facts (Human Knowledge, Chapter IX). In that text, he argues that what makes “this is not blue” true (and what makes “this is blue” false) is the existence of some color differing from blue. Unlike his earlier period he now thinks this color other than blue neither is nor implies commitment to a negative fact.

e. The Study of Language

Russell’s late work assumes that it is meaningful and possible to study the relation between experience and language and how certain extra-linguistic experiences give rise to linguistic ones, for example, how the sight of butter causes someone to assert “this is butter” or how the taste of cheese causes someone to “this is not butter.” Language, for Russell, is a fact and can be examined scientifically like any other fact. In The Logical Syntax of Language (1934) Rudolph Carnap had argued that that a science may choose to talk in subjective terms about sense data or in objective terms about physical objects since there are multiple equally legitimate ways to talk about the world. Hence Carnap does not believe that in studying language scientifically we must take account of metaphysical contentions about the nature of experience and its relation to language. Russell opposes Rudolf Carnap’s work and logical positivism, that is, logical empiricism, for dismissing his kind of approach as metaphysical nonsense, not a subject of legitimate philosophical study, and he defends it as an attempt to arrive at the truth about the language of experience, as an investigation into an empirical phenomenon.

7. References and Further Reading

The following is a selection of texts for further reading on Russell’s metaphysics. A great deal of his writing on logic, the theory of knowledge, and on educational, ethical, social, and political issues is therefore not represented here. Given the staggering amount of writing by Russell, not to mention on Russell, it is not intended to be exhaustive. The definitive bibliographical listing of Russell’s own publications takes up three volumes; it is to be found in Blackwell, Kenneth, Harry Ruja, and Sheila Turcon. A Bibliography of Bertrand Russell, 3 volumes. London and New York: Routledge, 1994.

a. Primary Sources

i. Monographs

  • 1897. An Essay on the Foundations of Geometry. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1900. A Critical Exposition of the Philosophy of Leibniz. Cambridge, UK: University Press.
  • 1903. The Principles of Mathematics. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1910-1913. Principia Mathematica, with Alfred North Whitehead. 3 vols. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge Univ. Press. Revised ed., 1925-1927.
  • 1912. The Problems of Philosophy. London: Williams and Norgate.
  • 1914. Our Knowledge of the External World as a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy. Chicago: Open Court. Revised edition, London: George Allen & Unwin, 1926.
  • 1919. Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • 1921. The Analysis of Mind. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • 1927. The Analysis of Matter. London: Kegan Paul.
  • 1940. An Inquiry into Meaning and Truth. New York: W. W. Norton.
  • 1948. Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits. London: George Allen & Unwin.

ii. Collections of Essays

  • 1910. Philosophical Essays. London: Longmans, Green. Revised ed., London: George Allen & Unwin, 1966.
  • 1918. Mysticism and Logic and Other Essays. London: Longmans, Green.
  • 1956. Logic and Knowledge: Essays 1901-1950, ed. Robert Charles Marsh. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • 1973. Essays in Analysis, edited by Douglas Lackey. London: George Allen & Unwin.

iii. Articles

  • “Letter to Frege.” (Written in 1902) In From Frege to Gödel, ed. J. van Heijenoort, 124-5. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard Univ. Press, 1967.
  • “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions.” Mind 13 (1904): 204-19, 336-54, 509-24. Repr. Essays in Analysis.
  • “On Denoting.” Mind 14 (1905): 479-493. Repr. Logic and Knowledge.
  • Review of Meinong et al., Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie und Psychologie. Mind 14 (1905): 530-8. Repr. Essays in Analysis.
  • “On the Substitutional Theory of Classes and Relations.” In Essays in Analysis. Written 1906.
  • “On the Nature of Truth.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 7 (1906-07): 28-49. Repr. (with the final section excised) as “The Monistic Theory of Truth” in Philosophical Essays.
  • “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types.” American Journal of Mathematics 30 (1908): 222-262. Repr. Logic and Knowledge.
  • “On the Nature of Truth and Falsehood.” In Philosophical Essays.
  • “Analytic Realism.” Bulletin de la société française de philosophie 11 (1911): 53-82. Repr. Collected Papers 6.
  • “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 11 (1911): 108-128. Repr. Mysticism and Logic.
  • “On the Relations of Universals and Particulars.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 12 (1912): 1-24. Repr. Logic and Knowledge.
  • “The Ultimate Constituents of Matter.” The Monist, 25 (1915): 399-417. Repr. Mysticism and Logic.
  • “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism.” The Monist 28 (1918): 495-27; 29 (1919): 32-63, 190-222, 345-80. Repr. Logic and Knowledge. Published in 1972 as Russell’s Logical Atomism, edited and with an introduction by David Pears. London: Fontana. Republished in 1985 as Philosophy of Logical Atomism, with a new introduction by D. Pears.
  • “On Propositions: What They Are and How They Mean.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society. Sup. Vol. 2 (1919): 1 - 43. Repr. Logic and Knowledge.
  • “The Meaning of ‘Meaning.’” Mind 29 (1920): 398-401.
  • “Logical Atomism.” In Contemporary British Philosophers, ed. J.H. Muirhead, 356-83. London: Allen & Unwin, 1924. Repr. Logic and Knowledge.
  • Review of Ramsey, The Foundations of Mathematics. Mind 40 (1931): 476- 82.
  • “The Limits of Empiricism.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 36 (1936): 131-50.
  • “On Verification.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 38 (1938): 1-20.
  • “My Mental Development.” In The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, ed. P.A. Schilpp, 1-20. Evanston: Northwestern University, 1944.
  • “Reply to Criticisms.” In The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, ed. P.A. Schilpp. Evanston: Northwestern, 1944.
  • “The Problem of Universals.” Polemic, 2 (1946): 21-35. Repr. Collected Papers 11.
  • “Is Mathematics Purely Linguistic?” In Essays in Analysis, 295-306.
  • “Logical Positivism.” Revue internationale de philosophie 4 (1950): 3-19. Repr. Logic and Knowledge.
  • “Logic and Ontology.” Journal of Philosophy 54 (1957): 225-30. Reprinted My Philosophical Development.
  • “Mr. Strawson on Referring.” Mind 66 (1957): 385-9. Repr. My Philosophical Development.
  • “What is Mind?” Journal of Philosophy 55 (1958): 5-12. Repr. My Philosophical Development.

iv. The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell

  • Volume 1. Cambridge Essays, 1888-99. (Vol. 1) Ed. Kenneth Blackwell, Andrew Brink, Nicholas Griffin, Richard A. Rempel and John G. Slater. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1983.
  • Volume 2. Philosophical Papers, 1896-99. Ed. Nicholas Griffin and Albert C. Lewis. London: Unwin Hyman, 1990.
  • Volume 3. Towards the “Principles of Mathematics,” 1900-02. Ed. Gregory H. Moore. London and New York: Routledge, 1994.
  • Volume 4. Foundations of Logic, 1903-05. Ed. Alasdair Urquhart. London and New York: Routledge, 1994.
  • Volume 6. Logical and Philosophical Papers, 1909-13. Ed. John G. Slater. London and New York: Routledge, 1992.
  • Volume 7. Theory of Knowledge: The 1913 Manuscript. Ed. Elizabeth Ramsden Eames. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1984.
  • Volume 8. The Philosophy of Logical Atomism and Other Essays, 1914-1919. Ed. John G. Slater. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1986.
  • Volume 9. Essays on Language, Mind, and Matter, 1919-26. Ed. John G. Slater. London: Unwin Hyman, 1988.
  • Volume 10. A Fresh Look at Empiricism, 1927-1942. Ed. John G. Slater. London and New York: Routledge, 1996.
  • Volume 11. Last Philosophical Testament, 1943-1968. Ed. John G. Slater. London and New York: Routledge, 1997.

v. Autobiographies and Letters

  • 1944. “My Mental Development.” The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, ed. Paul A. Schilpp, 1-20. Evanston: Northwestern University.
  • 1956. Portraits from Memory and Other Essays. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • 1959. My Philosophical Development. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • 1967-9. The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell. 3 vols. London: George Allen & Unwin.

b. Secondary sources

i. General Surveys

  • Ayer, A.J.. Bertrand Russell. New York: Viking Press, 1972.
  • Dorward, Alan. Bertrand Russell: A Short Guide to His Philosophy. London: Longmans, Green, and Co, 1951.
  • Eames, Elizabeth Ramsden. Bertrand Russell’s Dialogue with His Contemporaries. Carbondale, Ill.: Southern Illinois Univ. Press, 1989.
  • Griffin, Nicholas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Bertrand Russell. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Jager, Ronald. The Development of Bertrand Russell’s Philosophy. London: George Allen and Unwin, 1972.
  • Klemke, E.D., ed. Essays on Bertrand Russell. Urbana: Univ. of Illinois Press, 1970.
  • Sainsbury, R. M. Russell. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979.
  • Schilpp, Paul, ed. The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell. Evanston: Northwestern University, 1944.
  • Schoenman, Ralph, ed. Bertrand Russell: Philosopher of the Century. London: Allen & Unwin, 1967.
  • Slater, John G. Bertrand Russell. Bristol: Thoemmes, 1994.

ii. History of Analytic Philosophy

  • Griffin, Nicholas. Russell’s Idealist Apprenticeship. Oxford: Clarendon, 1991.
  • Hylton, Peter. Russell, Idealism and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990.
  • Irvine, A.D. and G.A. Wedeking, eds. Russell and Analytic Philosophy. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1993.
  • Monk, Ray, and Anthony Palmer, eds. Bertrand Russell and the Origins of Analytic Philosophy. Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 1996.
  • Pears, David. Bertrand Russell and the British Tradition in Philosophy. London: Fontana Press, 1967.
  • Savage, C. Wade and C. Anthony Anderson, eds. Rereading Russell: Essays on Bertrand Russell’s Metaphysics and Epistemology. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
  • Stevens, Graham. The Russellian Origins of Analytical Philosophy: Bertrand Russell and the Unity of the Proposition. London and New York: Routledge, 2005.

iii. Logic and Metaphysics

  • Costello, Harry. “Logic in 1914 and Now.” Journal of Philosophy 54 (1957): 245-263.
  • Frege, Gottlob. Philosophical and Mathematical Correspondence. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980.
  • Griffin, Nicholas. “Russell on the Nature of Logic (1903-1913).” Synthese 45 (1980): 117-188.
  • Hylton, Peter. “Logic in Russell’s Logicism.” In The Analytic Tradition, ed. Bell and Cooper, 137-72. Oxford: Blackwell, 1990.
  • Hylton, Peter. “Functions and Propositional Functions in Principia Mathematica.” In Russell and Analytic Philosophy, ed. Irvine and Wedeking, 342-60. Toronto: Univ. of Toronto Press, 1993.
  • Linsky, Bernard. Russell’s Metaphysical Logic. Stanford: CSLI Publications, 1999.
  • Ramsey, Frank P. The Foundations of Mathematics. Paterson, NJ: Littlefield, Adams and Co, 1960. Repr. as Philosophical Papers. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge Univ. Press, 1990
  • Frege, Gottlob. “Letter to Russell.” In From Frege to Gödel, ed. J. van Heijenoort, 126-8. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard Univ. Press, 1967.
  • Ramsey, F.P. “Mathematical Logic.” Mathematical Gazette 13 (1926), 185-194. Repr. Philosophical Papers, F.P. Ramsey, 225-44. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge Univ. Press, 1990.
  • Rouilhan Philippe de. “Substitution and Types: Russell’s Intermediate Theory.” In One Hundred Years of Russell’s Paradox, ed. Godehard Link, 401-16. Berlin: De Gruyter, 2004.

iv. Meaning and Metaphysics

  • Burge, T. “Truth and Singular Terms.” In Reference, Truth and Reality, ed. M. Platts, 167-81. London: Routledge & Keegan Paul, 1980.
  • Donnellan, K.S. “Reference and Definite Descriptions.” Philosophical Review 77 (1966): 281-304.
  • Geach, P., (1962). Reference and Generality. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1962.
  • Hylton, Peter. “The Significance of On Denoting.” In Rereading Russell, ed. Savage and Anderson, 88-107. Minneapolis: Univ. of Minnesota, 1989.
  • Kneale, William. “The Objects of Acquaintance.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 34 (1934): 187-210.
  • Kripke, S. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1980.
  • Linsky, B. “The Logical Form of Descriptions.” Dialogue 31 (1992): 677-83.
  • Marcus, R. “Modality and Description.” Journal of Symbolic Logic 13 (1948): 31-37. Repr. in Modalities: Philosophical Essays. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Neale, S. Descriptions. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press Books, 1990.
  • Searle, J. “Proper Names.” Mind 67 (1958): 166-173.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. “Acquaintance and Description Again.” Journal of Philosophy 46 (1949): 496-504.
  • Strawson, Peter F. “On Referring.” Mind 59 (1950): 320-344. Urmson, J.O. “Russell on Acquaintance with the Past.” Philosophical Review 78 (1969): 510-15.

v. Beliefs and Facts

  • Blackwell, Kenneth. “Wittgenstein’s Impact on Russell’s Theory of Belief.” M.A. thesis., McMaster University, 1974.
  • Carey, Rosalind. Russell and Wittgenstein on the Nature of Judgment. London: Continuum, 2007.
  • Eames, Elizabeth Ramsden. Bertrand Russell’s Theory of Knowledge. London: George Allen and Unwin, 1969.
  • Griffin, Nicholas. “Russell’s Multiple-Relation Theory of Judgment.” Philosophical Studies 47 (1985): 213-247.
  • Hylton, Peter. “The Nature of the Proposition and the Revolt Against Idealism.” In Philosophy in History, ed. Rorty, et al., 375-97. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge Univ. Press, 1984.
  • McGuinness, Brian. “Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Notes on Logic.” Revue Internationale de Philosophie 26 (1972): 444-60.
  • Oaklander, L. Nathan and Silvano Miracchi. “Russell, Negative Facts, and Ontology.” Philosophy of Science 47 (1980): 434-55.
  • Pears, David. “The Relation Between Wittgenstein’s Picture Theory of Propositions and Russell’s Theories of Judgment.” Philosophical Review 86 (1977): 177-96.
  • Rosenberg, Jay F. “Russell on Negative Facts.” Nous 6 (1972), 27-40.
  • Stevens, Graham. “From Russell’s Paradox to the Theory of Judgment: Wittgenstein and Russell on the Unity of the Proposition.” Theoria, 70 (2004): 28-61.

vi. Constructions

  • Blackwell, Kenneth. “Our Knowledge of Our Knowledge.” Russell: The Journal of the Bertrand Russell Archives, no. 12 (1973): 11-13.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. The Logical Structure of the World & Pseudo Problems in Philosophy, trans. R. George. Berkeley: Univ. of California Press, 1967.
  • Fritz, Charles Andrew, Jr. Bertrand Russell’s Construction of the External World. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1952.
  • Goodman, Nelson. The Structure of Appearance. Cambridge Mass: Harvard University Press, 1951.
  • Pincock, Christopher. “Carnap, Russell and the External World.” In The Cambridge Companion to Carnap, ed. M. Friedman and R. Creath. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
  • Pritchard, H. R. “Mr. Bertrand Russell on Our Knowledge of the External World.” Mind 24 (1915), 1-40.
  • Sainsbury, R.M. “Russell on Constructions and Fictions.” Theoria 46 (1980): 19-36.
  • Wisdom, J. “Logical Constructions (I.).” Mind 40 (April 1931): 188-216.

vii. Logical Atomism

  • Hochberg, Herbert. Thought, Fact and Reference: The Origins and Ontology of Logical Atomism. Minneapolis: Univ. of Minnesota Press, 1978.
  • Lycan, William. “Logical Atomism and Ontological Atoms.” Synthese 46 (1981), 207-229.
  • Linsky, Bernard. “The Metaphysics of Logical Atomism.” In The Cambridge Companion to Bertrand Russell, ed. N. Griffin, 371-92. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge Univ. Press, 2003.
  • Livingston, Paul. “Russellian and Wittgensteinian Atomism.” Philosophical Investigations 24 (2001): 30-54.
  • Lycan, William. “Logical Atomism and Ontological Atoms.” Synthese 46 (1981): 207-29.
  • Patterson, Wayne A. Bertrand Russell’s Philosophy of Logical Atomism. New York: Peter Lang Publishing, 1993.
  • Pears, David. ‘Introduction.’ In The Philosophy of Logical Atomism, B. Russell, 1-34. Chicago: Open Court, 1985.
  • Rodríguez-Consuegra, Francisco. “Russell’s Perilous Journey from Atomism to Holism 1919-1951.” In Bertrand Russell and the Origins of Analytical Philosophy, ed. Ray Monk and Anthony Palmer, 217-44. Bristol: Thoemmes, 1996.
  • Simons, Peter. “Logical Atomism.” In The Cambridge History of Philosophy, 1870-1945, ed. Thomas Baldwin, 383-90. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge Univ. Press, 2003.

viii. Naturalism and Psychology

  • Garvin, Ned S. “Russell’s Naturalistic Turn.” Russell: The Journal of Bertrand Russell Studies, n.s. 11, no. 1 (Summer 1991).
  • Gotlind, Erik. Bertrand Russell’s Theories of Causation. Uppsala: Almquist and Wiksell, 1952.
  • O’Grady, Paul. “The Russellian Roots of Naturalized Epistemology.” Russell: The Journal of Bertrand Russell Studies, n.s. 15, no. 1 (Summer 1995).
  • Stevens, Graham. “Russell’s Re-Psychologising of the Proposition.” Synthese 151, no. 1 (2006): 99-124.

ix. Biographies

  • Clark, Ronald W. The Life of Bertrand Russell. London: Jonathan Cape Ltd, 1975.
  • Monk, Ray. Bertrand Russell: The Spirit of Solitude, 1872-1921. New York: The Free Press, 1996.
  • Monk, Ray. Bertrand Russell 1921-1970: The Ghost of Madness. London: Jonathan Cape, 2000.
  • Moorehead, Caroline. Bertrand Russell. New York: Viking, 1992.
  • Wood, Alan. Bertrand Russell: The Passionate Sceptic. London: Allen and Unwin, 1957.

Author Information

Rosalind Carey
City University of New York
U. S. A.

Alfred North Whitehead (1861—1947)

WhiteheadAlfred North Whitehead was a notable mathematician, logician, educator and philosopher. The staggering complexity of Whitehead’s thought, coupled with the extraordinary literary quality of his writing, have conspired to make Whitehead (in an oft-repeated saying) one of the most-quoted but least-read philosophers in the Western canon. While he is widely recognized for his collaborative work with Bertrand Russell on the Principia Mathematica, he also made highly innovative contributions to philosophy, especially in the area of process metaphysics. Whitehead was an Englishman by birth and a mathematician by formal education. He was highly regarded by his students as a teacher and noted as a conscientious and hard-working administrator. The volume of his mathematical publication was never great, and much of his work has been eclipsed by more contemporary developments in the fields in which he specialized. Yet many of his works continue to stand out as examples of expository clarity without ever sacrificing logical rigor, while his theory of “extensive abstraction” is considered to be foundational in contemporary field of formal spatial relations known as “mereotopology.”

Whitehead’s decades-long focus on the logical and algebraic issues of space and geometry which led to his work on extension, became an integral part of an explosion of profoundly original philosophical work He began publishing even as his career as an academic mathematician was reaching a close. The first wave of these philosophical works included his Enquiry into the Principles of Natural Knowledge, The Concept of Nature, and The Principle of Relativity, published between 1919 and 1922. These books address the philosophies of science and nature, and include an important critique of the problem of measurement raised by Albert Einstein’s general theory of relativity. They also present an alternative theory of space and gravity. Whitehead built his system around an event-based ontology that interpreted time as essentially extensive rather than point-like.

Facing mandatory retirement in England, Whitehead accepted a position at Harvard in 1924, where he continued his philosophical output. His Science and the Modern World offers a careful critique of orthodox scientific materialism and presents his first worked-out version of the related fallacies of “misplaced concreteness” and “simple location.” The first fallacy is the error of treating an abstraction as though it were concretely real. The second is the error of assuming that anything that is real must have a simple spatial location. But the pinnacle of Whitehead’s metaphysical work came with his monumental Process and Reality in 1929 and his Adventures of Ideas in 1933. The first of these books gives a comprehensive and multi-layered categoreal system of internal and external relations that analyzes the logic of becoming an extension within the context of a solution to the problem of the one and the many, while also providing a ground for his philosophy of nature. The second is an outline of a philosophy of history and culture within the framework of his metaphysical scheme.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Thought and Writings
    1. Major Thematic Structures
    2. Mathematical Works
    3. Writings on Education
    4. Philosophy of Nature
    5. Metaphysical Works
  3. Influence and Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Alfred North Whitehead was born on February 15th, 1861 at Ramsgate in Kent, England, to Alfred and Maria Whitehead. Thought by his parents to be too delicate for the rough and tumble world of the English public school system, young Alfred was initially tutored at home. Ironically, when he was finally placed in public school, Whitehead became both head boy of his house and captain of his school’s rugby team. Whitehead always looked upon his days as a boy as a rather idyllic time. The education he received at home was always congenial to his natural habit of thinking, and he was able to spend long periods of time walking about in English country settings that were rich with history.

While Whitehead always enjoyed the classics, his true strength was with mathematics. Because of both its quality, and the unique opportunity to take the entrance examinations early, Alfred tested for Trinity College, Cambridge, in 1879, a year before he would otherwise have been allowed to enter. Whitehead’s focus was in mathematics, as were those of about half the hopefuls that were taking the competitive exams that year. While not in the very top tier, Whitehead’s exam scores were nevertheless good enough to gain him entrance into Trinity for the school year beginning in 1880, along with a £50 scholarship. While the money was certainly important, the scholarship itself qualified Whitehead for further rewards and considerations, and set him on the path to eventually being elected a Fellow of Trinity.

This happened in 1884, with the completion of his undergraduate work and his high standing in the finals examinations in mathematics for that year. Whitehead’s early career was focused on teaching, and it is known that he taught at Trinity during every term from 1884 to 1910. He traveled to Germany during an off-season at Cambridge (probably 1885), in part to learn more of the work of such German mathematicians as Felix Klein. Whitehead was also an ongoing member of various intellectual groups at Cambridge during this period. But he published nothing of note, and while he was universally praised as a teacher, the youthful Alfred displayed little promise as a researcher.

In 1891, when he was thirty years of age, Whitehead married Evelyn Wade. Evelyn was in every respect the perfect wife and partner for Alfred. While not conventionally intellectual, Evelyn was still an extremely bright woman, fiercely protective of Alfred and his work, and a true home-maker in the finest sense of the term. Although Evelyn herself was never fully accepted into the social structures of Cambridge society, she always ensured that Alfred lived in a comfortable, tastefully appointed home, and saw to it that he had the space and opportunity to entertain fellow scholars and other Cambrians in a fashion that always reflected well upon the mathematician.

It is also in this period that Whitehead began work on his first major publication, his Treatise on Universal Algebra. Perhaps with his new status as a family man, Whitehead felt the need to better establish himself as a Cambridge scholar. The book would ultimately be of minimal influence in the mathematical community. Indeed, the mathematical discipline that goes by that name shares only its name with Whitehead’s work, and is otherwise a very different area of inquiry. Still, the book established Whitehead’s reputation as a scholar of note, and was the basis for his 1903 election as a Fellow of the Royal Society.

It was after the publication of this work that Whitehead began the lengthy collaboration with his student, and ultimately Trinity Fellow, Bertrand Russell, on that monumental work that would become the Principia Mathematica. However, the final stages of this collaboration would not occur within the precincts of Cambridge. By 1910, Whitehead had been at Trinity College for thirty years, and he felt his creativity was being stifled. But it was also in this year that Whitehead’s friend and colleague Andrew Forsyth’s long-time affair with a married woman turned into a public indiscretion. It was expected that Forsyth would lose his Cambridge professorship, but the school took the extra step of withdrawing his Trinity Fellowship as well. Publicly in protest of this extravagant action, Whitehead resigned his own professorship (though not his Fellowship) as well. Privately, it was the excuse he needed to shake up his own life.

At the age of 49 and lacking even the promise of a job, Whitehead moved his family to London, where he was unemployed for the academic year of 1910 – 11. It was Evelyn who borrowed or bullied the money from their acquaintances that kept the family afloat during that time. Alfred finally secured a lectureship at University College, but the position offered no chance of growth or advancement for him. Finally in 1914, the Imperial College of Science and Technology in London appointed him as a professor of applied Mathematics.

It was here that Whitehead’s initial burst of philosophical creativity occurred. His decades of research into logic and spatial reasoning expressed itself in a series of three profoundly original books on the subjects of science, nature, and Einstein’s theory of relativity. At the same time, Whitehead maintained his teaching load while also assuming an increasing number of significant administrative duties. He was universally praised for his skill in all three of these general activities. However, by 1921 Whitehead was sixty years old and facing mandatory retirement within the English academic system. He would only be permitted to work until his sixty-fifth birthday, and then only with an annual dispensation from Imperial College. So it was that in 1924, Whitehead accepted an appointment as a professor of philosophy at Harvard University.

While Whitehead’s work at Imperial College is impressive, the explosion of works that came during his Harvard years is absolutely astounding. These publications include Science and the Modern World, Process and Reality, and Adventures of Ideas.

Whitehead continued to teach at Harvard until his retirement in 1937. He had been elected to the British Academy in 1931, and awarded the Order of Merit in 1945. He died peacefully on December 30th, 1947. Per the explicit instructions in his will, Evelyn Whitehead burned all of his unpublished papers. This action has been the source of boundless regret for Whitehead scholars, but it was Whitehead’s belief that evaluations of his thought should be based exclusively on his published work.

2. Thought and Writings

a. Major Thematic Structures

The thematic and historical analyses of Whitehead’s work largely coincide. However, these two approaches naturally lend themselves to slightly different emphases, and there are important historical overlaps of the dominating themes of his thought. So it is worthwhile to view these themes ahistorically prior to showing their temporal development.

The first of these thematic structures might reasonably be called “the problem of space.” The confluence of several trends in mathematical research set this problem at the very forefront of Whitehead’s own inquiries. James Clerk Maxwell’s Treatise on electromagnetism had been published in 1873, and Maxwell himself taught at Cambridge from 1871 until his death in 1879. The topic was a major subject of interest at Cambridge, and Whitehead wrote his Trinity Fellowship dissertation on Maxwell’s theory. During the same period, William Clifford in England, and Felix Klein and Wilhelm Killing in Germany were advancing the study of spaces of constant curvature. Whitehead was well aware of their work, as well as that of Hermann Grassmann, whose ideas would later become of central importance in tensor analysis.

The second major trend of Whitehead’s thought can be usefully abbreviated as “the problem of history,” although a more accurate descriptive phrase would be “the problem of the accretion of value.” Of the two themes, this one can be the more difficult to discern within Whitehead’s corpus, partly because it is often implicit and does not lend itself to formalized analysis. In its more obvious forms, this theme first appears in Whitehead’s writings on education. However, even in his earliest works, Whitehead’s concern with the function of symbolism as an instrument in the growth of knowledge shows a concern for the accretion of value. Nevertheless, it is primarily with his later philosophical work that this topic emerges as a central element and primary focus of his thought.

b. The Early Mathematical Works

Whitehead’s first major publication was his A Treatise on Universal Algebra with Applications (“UA,” 1898.) (Whenever appropriate, common abbreviations will be given, along with the year of publication, for Whitehead’s major works.) Originally intended as a two-volume work, the second volume never appeared as Whitehead’s thinking on the subject continued to evolve, and as the plans for Principia Mathematica eventually came to incorporate many of the objectives of this volume. Despite the “algebra” in the title, the work is primarily on the foundations of geometry and formal spatial relations. UA offers little in the way of original research by Whitehead. Rather, the work is primarily expository in character, drawing together a number of previously divergent and scattered themes of mathematical investigation into the nature of spatial relations and their underlying logic, and presenting them in a systematic form.

While the book helped establish Whitehead’s reputation as a scholar and was the basis of his election as a Fellow of the Royal Society, UA had little direct impact on mathematical research either then or later. Part of the problem was the timing and approach of Whitehead’s method. For while he was very explicit about the need for the rigorous development of symbolic logic, Whitehead’s logic was “algebraic” in character. That is to say, Whitehead's focus was on relational systems of order and structure preserving transformations. In contrast, the approaches of Giuseppe Peano and Gottlob Frege, with their emphasis on proof and semantic relations, soon became the focus of mathematical attention. While these techniques were soon to become of central importance for Whitehead’s own work, the centrality of algebraic methods to Whitehead’s thinking is always in evidence, especially in his philosophy of nature and metaphysics. The emphasis on structural relations in these works is a key component to understanding his arguments.

In addition, UA itself was one in a rising chorus of voices that had begun to take the work of Hermann Grassmann seriously. Grassmann algebras would come to play a vital role in tensor analysis and general relativity. Finally, the opening discussion of UA regarding the importance and uses of formal symbolism remains of philosophical interest, both in its own right and as an important element in Whitehead’s later thought.

Other early works by Whitehead include his two short books, the Axioms of Projective Geometry (1906) and the Axioms of Descriptive Geometry (1907). These works take a much more explicitly logical approach to their subject matter, as opposed to the algebraic techniques of Whitehead’s first book. However, it remains the case that these two works are not about presenting cutting edge research so much as they are about the clear and systematic development of existing materials. As suggested by their titles, the approach is axiomatic, with the axioms chosen for their illustrative and intuitive value, rather than their strictly logical parsimony. As such, these books continue to serve as clear and concise introductions to their subject matters.

Even as he was writing the two Axioms books, Whitehead was well into the collaboration with Bertrand Russell that would lead to the three volumes of the Principia Mathematica. Although most of the Principia was written by Russell, the work itself was a truly collaborative endeavor, as is demonstrated by the extant correspondence between the two. The intention of the Principia was to deduce the whole of arithmetic from absolutely fundamental logical principles. But Whitehead’s role in the project, besides working with Russell on the vast array of details in the first three volumes, was to be the principal author of a fourth volume whose focus would be the logical foundations of geometry. Thus, what Whitehead had originally intended to be the second volume of UA had transformed into the fourth volume of the Principia Mathematica, and like that earlier planned volume, the fourth part of Principia Mathematica never appeared. It would not be until Whitehead’s published work on the theory of extension, work that never appeared independently but always as a part of a larger philosophical enterprise, that his research into the foundations of geometry would finally pay off.

c. Writings on Education

By the time the Principia was published, Whitehead had left his teaching position at Trinity, and eventually secured a lectureship at London’s University College. It was in these London years that Whitehead published a number of essays and addresses on the theory of education. But it would be a mistake to suppose that his concern with education began with the more teaching-oriented (as opposed to research-oriented) positions he occupied after departing Cambridge. Whitehead had long been noted as an exceptional lecturer by his students at Cambridge. He also took on less popular teaching duties, such as teaching at the non-degree conferring women’s institutions associated with Cambridge of Girton and Newham colleges.

Moreover, the concern for the conveyance of ideas is evident from the earliest of Whitehead’s writings. The very opening pages of UA are devoted to a discussion of the reasons and economies of well-chosen symbols as aids to the advancement of thought. Or again, the intention underlying the two Axioms books was not so much the advancement of research as the communication of achieved developments in mathematics. Whitehead’s book, An Introduction to Mathematics (1911), published in the midst of the effort to get the Principia out, had no research agenda per se. This book was again entirely devoted toward introducing students to the character of mathematical thought, to the methods of abstraction, the nature of variables and functions, and to offer some sense of the power and generality of these formalisms.

Whitehead’s essays that specifically address education often do so with the explicit desire to revise the teaching of mathematics in England. But they also argue, both explicitly and implicitly, for a balance of liberal education devoted to the opening of the mind, with technical education intended to facilitate the vocational aptitudes of the student. Education for Whitehead was never just the mere memorization of ancient stories and empty abstractions, any more than it was just the technical training of the working class. It always entailed the growth of the student as a fully functioning human being. In this respect, as well as others, Whitehead’s arguments compare favorably with those of John Dewey [[hyperlink]].

Whitehead never systematized his educational thought the way Dewey did, so these ideas must be gleaned from his various essays and looked for as an implicit foundation to such larger works as his Adventures of Ideas (see below). Many of Whitehead’s essays on education were collected together in The Aims of Education, published in 1929, as well as his Essays in Science and Philosophy, published in 1948.

d. The Philosophy of Nature

Whitehead’s interest in the problem of space was, at least from his days as a graduate student at Cambridge, more than just an interest in the purely formal or mathematical aspects of geometry. It is to be recalled that his dissertation was on Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism, which was a major development in the ideas that led to Einstein’s theories of special and general relativity. The famous Michelson-Morely experiment to measure the so-called “Ether drift” was a response to Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism. Einstein himself offers only a generic nod toward the experiments regarding space and light in his 1905 paper on special relativity. The problem Einstein specifically cites in that paper is the lack of symmetry then to be found in theories of space and the behavior of electromagnetic phenomena. By 1910, when the first volume of the Principia Mathematica was being published, Hermann Minkowski had reorganized the mathematics of Einstein’s special relativity into a four-dimensional non-Euclidean manifold. By 1914, two years before the publication of Einstein’s paper on general relativity, theoretical developments had advanced to the extent that an expedition to the Crimea was planned to observe the predicted bending of stellar light around the sun during an eclipse. This expedition was cancelled with the eruption of the First World War.

These developments helped conspire to prevent Whitehead’s planned fourth volume of the Principia from ever appearing. A few papers appeared during the war years, in which a relational theory of space begins to emerge. What is perhaps most notable about these papers is that they are no longer specifically mathematical in nature, but are explicitly philosophical. Finally, in 1919 and 1920, Whitehead’s thought appeared in print with the publications of two books, An Enquiry into the Principles of Natural Knowledge (“PNK,” 1919) and The Concept of Nature (“CN,” 1920).

While PNK is much more formally technical than CN, both books share a common and radical view of nature and science that rejects the identification of nature with the mathematical tools used to characterize its relational structures. Nature for Whitehead is that which is experienced through the senses. For this reason, Whitehead argues that there are no such things as “points” of either time or space. An infinitesimal point is a high abstraction with no experiential reality, while time and space are irreducibly extensional in character.

To account for the effectiveness of mathematical abstractions in their application to natural knowledge, Whitehead introduced his theory of “extensive abstraction.” By using the logical and topological structures of concentric part-whole relations, Whitehead argued that abstract entities such as geometric points could be derived from the concrete, extensive relations of space and time. These abstract entities, in their turn, could be shown to be significant of the nature they had been abstractively derived from. Moreover, since these abstract entities were formally easier to use, their significance of nature could be retained through their various deductive relations, thereby giving evidence for further natural significances by this detour through purely abstract relations.

Whitehead also rejected “objects” as abstractions, and argued that the fundamental realities of both experience and nature are events. Events are themselves irreducibly extended entities, where the temporal / durational extension is primary. “Objects” are the idealized significances that retain a stable meaning through an event or family of events.

It is important to note here that Whitehead is arguing for a kind of empiricism. But, as Victor Lowe has noted, this empiricism is more akin to the ideas of William James than it is to the logical positivism of Whitehead’s day. In other words, Whitehead is arguing for a kind of Jamesian “radical empiricism,” in which sense-data are abstractions, and the basic deliverances of raw experience include such things as relations and complex events.

These ideas were further developed with the publication of Whitehead’s The Principles of Relativity with Applications to Natural Science (“R,” 1922). Here Whitehead proposed an alternative physical theory of space and gravity to Einstein’s general relativity. Whitehead’s theory has commonly been classified as “quasi-linear” in the physics literature, when it should properly be describes as “bimetric.” Einstein’s theory collapses the physical and the spatial into a single metric, so that gravity and space are essentially identified. Whitehead pointed out that this then loses the logical relations necessary to make meaningful cosmological measurements. In order to make meaningful measurements of space, we must know the geometry of that space so that the congruence relations of our measurement instruments can be projected through that space while retaining their significance. Since Einstein’s theory loses the distinction between the physical and the geometrical, the only way we can know the geometry of the space we are trying to measure is if we first know the distributions of matter and energy throughout the cosmos that affect that geometry. But we can only know these distributions if we can first make accurate measurements of space. Thus, as Whitehead argued, we are left in the position of first having to know everything before we can know anything.

Whitehead argued that the solution to this problem was to separate the necessary relations of geometry from the contingent relations of physics, so that one’s theory of space and gravity is “bimetric,” or is built from the two metrics of geometry and physics. Unfortunately, Whitehead never used the term “bimetric,” and his theory has often been misinterpreted. Questions of the viability of Whitehead’s specific theory have needlessly distracted both philosophers and physicists from the real issue of the class of theories of space and gravity that Whitehead was arguing for. Numerous viable bimetric alternatives to Einstein’s theory of relativity are currently known in the physics literature. But because Whitehead’s theory has been misclassified and its central arguments poorly understood, the connections between Whitehead’s philosophical arguments and these physical theories have largely gone unnoticed.

e. The Metaphysical Works

The problems Whitehead had engaged with his triad of works on the philosophy of nature and science required a complete re-evaluation of the assumptions of modern science. To this end, Whitehead published Science in the Modern World (“SMW,” 1925). This work had both a critical and a constructive aspect, although the critical themes occupied most of Whitehead’s attention. Central to those critical themes was Whitehead’s challenge to dogmatic scientific materialism developed through an analysis of the historical developments and contingencies of that belief. In addition, he continued with the themes of his earlier triad, arguing that objects in general, and matter in particular, are abstractions. What are most real are events and their mutual involvements in relational structures.

Already in PNK, Whitehead had characterized electromagnetic phenomena by saying that while such phenomena could be related to specific vector quantities at each specific point of space, they express “at all points one definite physical fact” (PNK, 29). Physical facts such as electromagnetic phenomena are single, relational wholes, but they are spread out across the cosmos. In SMW Whitehead called the failure to appreciate this holism and the relational connectedness of reality, “the fallacy of simple location.” According to Whitehead, much of contemporary science, driven as it was by the dogma of materialism, was committed to the fallacy that only such things as could be localized at a mathematically simple “point” of space and time were genuinely real. Relations and connections were, in this dogmatic view, secondary to and parasitic upon such simply located entities. Whitehead saw this as reversing the facts of nature and experience, and devoted considerable space in SMW to criticizing it.

A second and related fallacy of contemporary science was what Whitehead identified in SMW as, “the fallacy of misplaced concreteness.” While misplaced concreteness could include treating entities with a simple location as more real than those of a field of relations, it also went beyond this. Misplaced concreteness included treating “points” of space or time as more real than the extensional relations that are the genuine deliverances of experience. Thus, this fallacy resulted in treating abstractions as though they were concretely real. In Whitehead’s view, all of contemporary physics was infected by this fallacy, and the resultant philosophy of nature had reversed the roles of the concrete and the abstract.

The critical aspects of SMW were ideas that Whitehead had already expressed (in different forms) in his previous publications, only now with more refined clarity and persuasiveness. On the other hand, the constructive arguments in SMW are astonishing in their scope and subtlety, and are the first presentation of his mature metaphysical thinking. For example, the word “prehension,” which Whitehead defines as “uncognitive apprehension” (SMW 69) makes its first systematic appearance in Whitehead’s writings as he refines and develops the kinds and layers of relational connections between people and the surrounding world. As the “uncognitive” in the above is intended to show, these relations are not always or exclusively knowledge based, yet they are a form of “grasping” of aspects of the world. Our connection to the world begins with a “pre-epistemic” prehension of it, from which the process of abstraction is able to distill valid knowledge of the world. But that knowledge is abstract and only significant of the world; it does not stand in any simple one-to-one relation with the world. In particular, this pre-epistemic grasp of the world is the source of our quasi- a priori knowledge of space which enables us to know of those uniformities that make cosmological measurements, and the general conduct of science, possible.

SMW goes far beyond the purely epistemic program of Whitehead’s philosophy of nature. The final three chapters, entitled “God,” “Religion and Science,” and “Requisites for Social Progress,” clearly announce the explicit emergence of the second major thematic strand of Whitehead’s thought, the “problem of history” or “the accretion of value.” Moreover, these topics are engaged with the same thoroughly relational approach that Whitehead previously used with nature and science.

Despite the foreshadowing of these last chapters of SMW, Whitehead’s next book may well have come as a surprise to his academic colleagues. Whitehead’s brief Religion in the Making (“RM,” 1926) tackles no part of his earlier thematic problem of space, but instead focuses entirely on the second thematic of history and value. Whitehead defines religion as “what the individual does with his own solitariness” (RM 16). Yet it is still Whitehead the algebraist who is constructing this definition. Solitariness is understood as a multi-layered relational modality of the individual in and toward the world. In addition, this relational mode cannot be understood in separation from its history. On this point, Whitehead compares religion with arithmetic. Thus, an understanding of the latter makes no essential reference to its history, whereas for religion such a reference is vital. Moreover, as Whitehead states, “You use arithmetic, but you are religious” (RM 15).

Whitehead also argues that, “The purpose of God is the attainment of value in the temporal world,” and “Value is inherent in actuality itself” (RM 100). Whitehead’s use of the word “God” in the foregoing invites a wide range of habitual assumptions about his meaning, most, if not all, of which will probably be mistaken. The key element for Whitehead is value. God, like arithmetic, is discussed in terms of something which has a purpose. On the other hand, value is like being religious in that it is inherent. It is something that is rather than something that is used.

Shortly after this work, there appeared another book whose brevity betrays its importance, Symbolism its Meaning and Effect (“S,” 1927). Whitehead’s explicit interest in symbols was present in his earliest publication. But in conjunction with his theory of prehension, the theory of symbols came to take on an even greater importance for him. Our “uncognitive” sense-perceptions are directly caught up in our symbolic awareness as is shown by the immediacy with which we move beyond what is directly given to our senses. Whitehead uses the example of a puppy dog that sees a chair as a chair rather than as a patch of color, even though the latter is all that impinges on the dog’s retina. (Whitehead may not have known that dogs are color blind, but this does not significantly affect his example.) Thus, this work further develops Whitehead’s theories of perception and awareness, and does so in a manner that is relatively non-technical. Because of the centrality of the theory of symbols and perception to Whitehead’s later philosophy, this clarity of exposition makes this book a vital stepping stone to what followed.

What followed was Process and Reality (“PR,” 1929). This book is easily one of the most dense and difficult works in the entire Western canon. The book is rife with technical terms of Whitehead’s own invention, necessitated by his struggle to push beyond the inherited limits of the available concepts toward a comprehensive vision of the logical structures of becoming. It is here that we see the problem of space receive its ultimate payoff in Whitehead’s thought. But this payoff comes in the form of a fully relational metaphysical scheme that draws upon his theory of symbols and perception in the most essential manner possible. At the same time, PR plants the seeds for the further engagement of the problem of the accretion of value that is to come in his later work. Because each process of becoming must be considered holistically as an essentially organic unity, Whitehead often refers to his theory as the “philosophy of organism.”

PR invites controversy while defying brief exposition. Many of the relational ideas Whitehead develops are holistic in character, and thus do not lend themselves to the linear presentation of language. Moreover, the language Whitehead needs to build his holistic image of the world is often biological or mentalistic in character, which can be jarring when the topic being discussed is something like an electron. Moreover, Whitehead the algebraist was an intrinsically relational thinker, and explicitly characterized the subject / predicate mode of language as a “high abstraction.” Nevertheless, there are some basic ideas which can be quickly set out.

The first of these is that PR is not about time per se. This has been a subject of much confusion. But Whitehead himself points out that physical time as such only comes about with “reflection” of the “divisibility” of his two major relational types into one another (PR 288 – 9). Moreover, throughout PR, Whitehead continues to endorse the theory of nature found in his earlier triad of books on the subject. So the first step in gaining a handle on PR is to recognize that it is better thought of as addressing the logic of becoming, whereas his books from 1919 – 1922 address the “nature” of time.

The basic units of becoming for Whitehead are “actual occasions.” Actual occasions are “drops of experience,” and relate to the world into which they are emerging by “feeling” that relatedness and translating it into the occasion’s concrete reality. When first encountered, this mode of expression is likely to seem peculiar if not downright outrageous. One thing to note here is that Whitehead is not talking about any sort of high-level cognition. When he speaks of “feeling” he means an immediacy of concrete relatedness that is vastly different from any sort of “knowing,” yet which exists on a relational spectrum where cognitive modes can emerge from sufficiently complex collections of occasions that interrelate within a systematic whole. Also, feeling is a far more basic form of relatedness than can be represented by formal algebraic or geometrical schemata. These latter are intrinsically abstract, and to take them as basic would be to commit the fallacy of misplaced concreteness. But feeling is not abstract. Rather, it is the first and most concrete manifestation of an occasion’s relational engagement with reality.

This focus on concrete modes of relatedness is essential because an actual occasion is itself a coming into being of the concrete. The nature of this “concrescence,” using Whitehead’s term, is a matter of the occasion’s creatively internalizing its relatedness to the rest of the world by feeling that world, and in turn uniquely expressing its concreteness through its extensive connectedness with that world. Thus an electron in a field of forces “feels” the electrical charges acting upon it, and translates this “experience” into its own electronic modes of concreteness. Only later do we schematize these relations with the abstract algebraic and geometrical forms of physical science. For the electron, the interaction is irreducibly concrete.

Actual occasions are fundamentally atomic in character, which leads to the next interpretive difficulty. In his previous works, events were essentially extended and continuous. And when Whitehead speaks of an “event” in PR without any other qualifying adjectives, he still means the extensive variety found in his earlier works (PR 73). But PR deals with a different set of problems from that previous triad, and it cannot take such continuity for granted. For one thing, Whitehead treats Zeno's Paradoxes very seriously and argues that one cannot resolve these paradoxes if one starts from the assumption of continuity, because it is then impossible to make sense of anything coming immediately before or immediately after anything else. Between any two points of a continuum such as the real number line there are an infinite number of other points, thus rendering the concept of the “next” point meaningless. But it is precisely this concept of the “next occasion” that Whitehead requires to render intelligible the relational structures of his metaphysics. If there are infinitely many occasions between any two occasions, even ones that are nominally “close” together, then it becomes impossible to say how it is that later occasions feel their predecessors – there is an unbounded infinity of other occasions intervening in such influences, and changing it in what are now undeterminable ways. Therefore, Whitehead argued, continuity is not something which is “given;” rather it is something which is achieved. Each occasion makes itself continuous with its past in the manner in which it feels that past and creatively incorporates the past into its own concrescence, its coming into being.

Thus, Whitehead argues against the “continuity of becoming” and in favor of the “becoming of continuity” (PR 68 – 9). Occasions become atomically, but once they have become they incorporate themselves into the continuity of the universe by feeling the concreteness of what has come before and making that concreteness a part of the occasion’s own internal makeup. The continuity of space and durations in Whitehead’s earlier triad does not conflict with his metaphysical atomism, because those earlier works were dealing with physical nature in which continuity has already come into being, while PR is dealing with relational structures that are logically and metaphysically prior to nature.

Most authors believe that the sense of “atomic” being used here is similar to, if not synonymous with, “microscopic.” However, there are reasons why one might want to resist such an interpretation. To begin with, it teeters on the edge of the fallacy of simple location to assume that by “atomic” Whitehead means “very small.” An electron, which Whitehead often refers to as an “electronic occasion,” may have a tiny region of most highly focused effects. But the electromagnetic field that spreads out from that electron reaches far beyond that narrow focus. The electron “feels” and is “felt” throughout this field of influence which is not spatially limited. Moreover, Whitehead clearly states that space and time are derivative notions from extension whereas, “To be an actual occasion in the physical world means that the entity in question is a relatum in this scheme of extensive connection” (PR 288 – 9). The quality of being microscopic is something that only emerges after one has a fully developed notion of space, while actual occasions are logically prior to space and a part of the extensive relations from which space itself is derived. Thus it is at least arguably the case that the sense of “atomic” that Whitehead is employing hearkens back more to the original Greek meaning of “irreducible” than to the microscopic sense that pervades physical science. In other words, the “atomic” nature of what is actual is directly connected to its relational holism.

The structure of PR is also worth attention, for each of the five major parts offers a significant perspective on the whole. Part I gives Whitehead’s defense of speculative philosophy and sets out the “categoreal scheme” underlying PR. The second part applies these categories to a variety of historical and thematic topics. Part three gives the theory of prehensions as these manifest themselves with and through the categories, and is often called the “genetic account.” The theory of extension, or the “coordinate account,” constitutes part four and represents the ultimate development of Whitehead’s rigorous thought on the nature of space. The last and final part presents both a theory of the dialectic of opposites, and the minimalist role of God in Whitehead’s system as the foundation of coherence in the world’s processes of becoming.

Two of the features of part I that stand out are Whitehead’s defense of speculative philosophy, and his proposed resolution of the traditional problem of the One and the Many. “Speculative philosophy” for Whitehead is a phrase he uses interchangeably with “metaphysics.” However, what Whitehead means is a speculative program in the most scientifically honorific sense of the term. Rejecting any form of dogmatism, Whitehead states that his purpose is to, “frame a coherent, logical, necessary system of general ideas in terms of which every element of our experience can be interpreted” (PR 3). The second feature, the solution to the problem of the “one and the many,” is often summarized as, “The many become one, and increase by one.” This means that the many occasions of the universe that have already become contribute their atomic reality to the becoming of a new occasion (“the many become one”). However, this occasion, upon fully realizing in its own atomic character, now contributes that reality to the previously achieved realities of the other occasions (“and increase by one”).

The atomic becoming of an actual occasion is achieved by that occasion’s “prehensive” relations and its “extensive” relations. An actual occasion’s holistically felt and non-sequentially internalized concrete evaluations of its relationships to the rest of the world is the subject matter of the theory of “prehension,” part III of PR. This is easily one of the most difficult and complex portions of that work. The development that Whitehead is describing is so holistic and anti-sequential that it might appropriately be compared to James Joyce’s Finnegan’s Wake. An actual occasion “prehends” its world (relationally takes that world in) by feeling the “objective data” of past occasions which the new occasion utilizes in its own concrescence. This data is prehended in an atemporal and nonlinear manner, and is creatively combined into the occasion’s own manifest self-realization. This is to say that the becoming of the occasion is also informed by a densely teleological sense of the occasion’s own ultimate actuality, its “subjective aim” or what Whitehead calls the occasion’s “superject.” Once it has become fully actualized, the occasion as superject becomes an objective datum for those occasions which follow it, and the process begins again.

This same process of concrescence is described in its extensive characters in part IV, where the mereological (formal relations of part and whole) as well as topological (non-metrical relations of neighborhood and connection) characteristics of extension are developed. Unlike the subtle discussion of prehensions, Whitehead’s theory of extension reads very much like a text book on the logic of spatial relations. Indeed, a great deal of contemporary work in artificial intelligence and spatial reasoning identifies this section of PR as foundational to this field of research, which often goes by the intimidating title of “mereotopology.”

The holistic character of prehension and the analytical nature of extension invite the reader to interpret the former as a theory of “internal relations” and the latter as a theory of “external relations.” Put simply, external relations treat the self-identity of a thing as the first, analytically given fact, while internal relations treat it as the final, synthetically developed result. But Whitehead explicitly associates internal relations with extension, and externality with that of prehension. This seeming paradox can be resolved by noting that, even though prehension is the process of the actual occasion’s “internalizing” the rest of reality as it composes its own self-identity, the achieved result (the superject) is the atomic realization of that occasion in its ultimate externality to the rest of the world. On the other hand, the mereological relations of part and whole from which extension is built, are themselves so intrinsically correlative to one another that each only meaningfully expresses its own relational structures to the extent that it completely internalizes the other.

Whitehead was never one to revisit a problem once he felt he had addressed it adequately. With the publication of PR and the final version of his theory of extension, Whitehead never returned to the ‘problem of space’ except on those limited occasions when his later work required that he mention those earlier developments. Those later works were effectively focused upon the ‘problem of history’ to the exclusion of all else. The primary book on this topic is Adventures of Ideas (“AI,” 1933).

AI is a pithy and engaging book whose opening pages entice the reader with clear and evidently non-technical language. But it is a book that needs to be approached with care. Whitehead assumes, without explanation, knowledge on the part of his readers of the metaphysical scheme of PR, and resorts to the terminology of that book whenever the argument requires it. Indeed, AI is the application of Whitehead’s process metaphysics to the “problem of history.” Whitehead surveys numerous cultural forms from a thoroughly relational perspective, analyzing the ways in which these connections contribute both to the rigidities of culture and the possibilities for novelty in various “adventures” in the accumulation of meanings and values. Many of the forces in this adventure of meaning are blind and senseless, thus presenting the challenge of becoming more deliberate in our processes of building and changing them.

In line with this, two other works bear mentioning: The Function of Reason (“FR,” 1929) and Modes of Thought (“MT,” 1938). FR presents an updated version of Aristotle’s three classes of soul (the vegetative, the animate, and the rational); only in Whitehead’s case, the classifications are, as the title states, functional rather than facultative. Thus, for Whitehead, the function of reason is “promote the art of life,” which is a three-fold function of “(i) to live, (ii) to live well, (iii) to live better” (FR 4, 8). Thus, reason for Whitehead is intrinsically organic in both origin and purpose. But the achievement of a truly reasonable life is a matter that involves more than just the logical organization of propositional knowledge. It is a matter of full and sensitive engagement with the entire lived world. This is the topic of MT, Whitehead’s final major publication. In arguing for a multiplicity of modes of thought, Whitehead offered his final great rebellion against the excessive focus on language that dominated the philosophical thought of his day. In this work, Whitehead also offered his final insight as to the purpose and function of philosophy itself. “The use of philosophy,” Whitehead concluded, “is to maintain an active novelty of fundamental ideas illuminating the social system. It reverses the slow descent of accepted thought towards the inactive commonplace.” In this respect, “philosophy is akin to poetry” (MT 174).

3. Influence and Legacy

Evaluating Whitehead’s influence is a difficult matter. While Whitehead’s influence has never been great, in the opening years of the 21st century it appears to be growing in a broad range of otherwise divergent disciplines. Fulfilling his own vision of the use of philosophy, Whitehead’s ideas are a rich trove of alternative approaches to traditional problems. His thoroughgoing relational and process orientation offers numerous opportunities to reimagine the ways in which the world is connected and how those connections manifest themselves.

The most prominent area of ongoing Whiteheadian influence is within process theology. While Whitehead’s explicit philosophical treatments of God seldom went beyond that of an ideal principle of maximal coherence, many others have developed these ideas further. Writers such as Charles Hartshorne and John Cobb have speculated on, and argued for, a much more robust, ontological conception of God. Nothing in Whitehead’s own writings require such developments, but neither are they in any way precluded. The God of process theology tends to be far more personal and much more of a co-participant in the creative process of the universe than that which one often finds in orthodox religions.

Within philosophy itself, Whitehead’s influence has been smaller and much more diffuse. Yet those influences are likely to crop up in what seem, on the surface at least, to be improbable places. The literature here is too vast to enumerate, but it includes researches from all of the major philosophical schools including pragmatism, analytical, and continental thought. The topics engaged include ontology, phenomenology, personalism, philosophical anthropology, ethics, political theory, economics, etc.

There are also a variety of ways in which Whitehead’s work continues to influence scientific research. This influence is, again, typically found only in the work of widely scattered individuals. However, one area where this is not the case is Whitehead’s theory of extension. Whitehead’s work on the logical basis of geometry is widely cited as foundational in the study of mereotopology, which in turn is of fundamental importance in the study of spatial reasoning, especially in the context of artificial intelligence.

There is also a growing interest in Whitehead’s work within physics, where it is proving to be a valuable source of ideas to help re-conceive the nature of physical relations. This is particularly true of such bizarre phenomena as quantum entanglement, which seems to violate orthodox notions of mechanistic interaction. There is a renewed interest in Whitehead’s arguments regarding relativity, particularly because of their potential tie-in with other bimetric theories of space and gravity. Other areas of interest include biology, where Whitehead’s holistic relationalism again offers alternative models of explanation.

4. References and Further Reading

Those of Whitehead’s primary texts which have been mentioned in the article are listed below in chronological order. More technical works have been “starred” with an asterisk. Original publication dates are given, as well as more recent printings. Of these more recent printings, those done by Dover Publications have been favored because they retain the pagination of the original imprints. On the other hand, the volume of the secondary literature on Whitehead is truly astounding, and a comprehensive list would go far beyond the limits of this article. So while the secondary works listed below can hardly be viewed as definitive, they do offer a useful starting place. The secondary sources are divided into two groups, those that are relatively more accessible and those that are relatively more technical.

a. Primary Sources

  • *A Treatise on Universal Algebra (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1898.)
  • *The Axioms of Projective Geometry (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1906.)
  • *The Axioms of Descriptive Geometry, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1907. Mineaola: Dover Phoenix Editions, 2005.)
    • The two Axioms books are models of expository clarity, yet they are still books on formal mathematics. Hence, they have been reluctantly “starred.”
  • *Principia Mathematica, volumes I – III, with Bertrand Russell (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1910 – 1913.)
  • An Introduction to Mathematics (London: Home University Library of Modern Knowledge, 1911. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1958.)
  • *An Enquiry into the Principles of Natural Knowledge (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1919.)
  • The Concept of Nature (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1920. Mineola: Dover, May 2004.)
  • *The Principle of Relativity with Applications to Physical Science (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1922. Mineola: Dover Phoenix Editions, 2004.)
  • Science and the Modern World (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1925. New York: The Free Press, 1967.)
  • Religion in the Making (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1926. New York: Fordham University Press, 1996.)
    • This later edition is particularly useful because of the detailed glossary of terms at the end of the text.
  • Symbolism, Its Meaning and Effect (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1927. New York: Fordham University Press, 1985.)
  • The Aims of Education (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1929. New York: The Free Press, 1967.)
  • **Process and Reality (New York: The Macmillan Company 1929. New York: The Free Press, 1978.)
    • Easily one of the most difficult books in the entire Western philosophical canon, this volume earns two asterisks.
  • The Function of Reason (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1929. Boston: Beacon Press, 1962.)
  • *Adventures of Ideas (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1933. New York: The Free Press, 1985.)
  • Modes of Thought (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1938. New York: The Free Press, 1968.)
  • Essays in Science and Philosophy (New York: Philosophical Library Inc., 1948.)

b. Secondary Sources

(Relatively more accessible secondary texts:)

  • Eastman, Timothy E. and Keeton, Hank (editors): Physics and Whitehead: Quantum, Process, and Experience (Albany: State University of New York Press, January 2004.)
    • This is an important recent survey of some of the ways in which Whitehead’s thought is being employed in contemporary physics.
  • Kraus, Elizabeth M.: The Metaphysics of Experience (New York: Fordham University Press, April 1979.)
    • This book is a particularly useful companion to PR because of the care with which Kraus has flow-charted the relational structures of Whitehead’s argument.
  • Lowe, Victor: Alfred North Whitehead: The Man and his Work, volumes I and II (Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins Press, 1985 & 1990.)
    • These volumes are the definitive biography of Whitehead.
  • Mesle, C. Robert & Cobb, John B.: Process Theology: A Basic Introduction (Atlanta: Chalice Press, September 1994.)
    • This is a solid and very readable survey of contemporary process theology.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur, editor: The Philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead, “The Library of Living Philosophers,” (LaSalle: Open Court Publishing Company, 1951.)
    • This book is a collection of essays on Whitehead’s work by his contemporaries.

(Relatively more technical secondary texts:)

  • Casati, Roberto and Varzi, Achille C.: Parts and Places: The Structures of Spatial Representation (Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 1999.)
    • This text is a college level introduction to mereotopology, and includes an extensive bibliography on the subject and its history.
  • Ford, Lewis: Emergence of Whitehead's Metaphysics, 1925-1929 (Albany: SUNY Press, 1985.)
    • This book is an examination of the historical development of Whitehead’s metaphysical ideas.
  • Hall, David L.: The Civilization of Experience, A Whitehedian Theory of Culture (New York: Fordham University Press, New 1973.)
    • Hall’s work attempts, among other things, to derive an ethical theory from Whitehead’s metaphysics.
  • Jones, Judith A. Intensity: An Essay in Whiteheadian Ontology (Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1998.)
    • This work is widely considered to be one of the most important pieces of secondary literature on Whitehead.
  • Nobo, Jorge Luis.: Whitehead’s Metaphysics of Extension and Solidarity (Albany: SUNY Press, 1986.)
  • Palter, William: Whitehead's Philosophy of Science (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, June 1960.)
    • This work is widely viewed as the definitive text on Whitehead’s theory of science and nature.

Author Information

Gary L. Herstein
Southern Illinois University at Carbondale
U. S. A.

Analytic Philosophy

The school of analytic philosophy has dominated academic philosophy in various regions, most notably Great Britain and the United States, since the early twentieth century. It originated around the turn of the twentieth century as G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell broke away from what was then the dominant school in the British universities, Absolute Idealism. Many would also include Gottlob Frege as a founder of analytic philosophy in the late 19th century, and this controversial issue is discussed in section 2c. When Moore and Russell articulated their alternative to Idealism, they used a linguistic idiom, frequently basing their arguments on the “meanings” of terms and propositions. Additionally, Russell believed that the grammar of natural language often is philosophically misleading, and that the way to dispel the illusion is to re-express propositions in the ideal formal language of symbolic logic, thereby revealing their true logical form. Because of this emphasis on language, analytic philosophy was widely, though perhaps mistakenly, taken to involve a turn toward language as the subject matter of philosophy, and it was taken to involve an accompanying methodological turn toward linguistic analysis. Thus, on the traditional view, analytic philosophy was born in this linguistic turn. The linguistic conception of philosophy was rightly seen as novel in the history of philosophy. For this reason analytic philosophy is reputed to have originated in a philosophical revolution on the grand scale—not merely in a revolt against British Idealism, but against traditional philosophy on the whole.

Analytic philosophy underwent several internal micro-revolutions that divide its history into five phases. The first phase runs approximately from 1900 to 1910. It is characterized by the quasi-Platonic form of realism initially endorsed by Moore and Russell as an alternative to Idealism. Their realism was expressed and defended in the idiom of “propositions” and “meanings,” so it was taken to involve a turn toward language. But its other significant feature is its turn away from the method of doing philosophy by proposing grand systems or broad syntheses and its turn toward the method of offering narrowly focused discussions that probe a specific, isolated issue with precision and attention to detail. By 1910, both Moore and Russell had abandoned their propositional realism—Moore in favor of a realistic philosophy of common sense, Russell in favor of a view he developed with Ludwig Wittgenstein called logical atomism. The turn to logical atomism and to ideal-language analysis characterizes the second phase of analytic philosophy, approximately 1910-1930. The third phase, approximately 1930-1945, is characterized by the rise of logical positivism, a view developed by the members of the Vienna Circle and popularized by the British philosopher A. J. Ayer. The fourth phase, approximately 1945-1965, is characterized by the turn to ordinary-language analysis, developed in various ways by the Cambridge philosophers Ludwig Wittgenstein and John Wisdom, and the Oxford philosophers Gilbert Ryle, John Austin, Peter Strawson, and Paul Grice.

During the 1960s, criticism from within and without caused the analytic movement to abandon its linguistic form. Linguistic philosophy gave way to the philosophy of language, the philosophy of language gave way to metaphysics, and this gave way to a variety of philosophical sub-disciplines. Thus the fifth phase, beginning in the mid 1960s and continuing beyond the end of the twentieth century, is characterized by eclecticism or pluralism. This post-linguistic analytic philosophy cannot be defined in terms of a common set of philosophical views or interests, but it can be loosely characterized in terms of its style, which tends to emphasize precision and thoroughness about a narrow topic and to deemphasize the imprecise or cavalier discussion of broad topics.

Even in its earlier phases, analytic philosophy was difficult to define in terms of its intrinsic features or fundamental philosophical commitments. Consequently, it has always relied on contrasts with other approaches to philosophy—especially approaches to which it found itself fundamentally opposed—to help clarify its own nature. Initially, it was opposed to British Idealism, and then to "traditional philosophy" at large. Later, it found itself opposed both to classical Phenomenology (for example, Husserl) and its offspring, such as Existentialism (Sartre, Camus, and so forth) and also "Continental"’ or "Postmodern" philosophy (Heidegger, Foucault and Derrida). Though classical Pragmatism bears some similarity to early analytic philosophy, especially in the work of C. S. Peirce and C. I. Lewis, the pragmatists are usually understood as constituting a separate tradition or school.

Table of Contents

  1. The Revolution of Moore and Russell: Cambridge Realism and The Linguistic Turn
  2. Russell and the Early Wittgenstein: Ideal Language and Logical Atomism
    1. The Theory of Descriptions
    2. Ideal-Language Philosophy vs. Ordinary-Language Philosophy
    3. Frege: Influence or Instigator?
    4. Logical Atomism and Wittgenstein’s Tractatus
  3. Logical Positivism, the Vienna Circle, and Quine
    1. Logical Positivism and the Vienna Circle
    2. W. V. Quine
  4. The Later Wittgenstein and Ordinary-Language Philosophy
    1. Ordinary-Language Philosophy
    2. The Later Wittgenstein
  5. The 1960s and After: The Era of Eclecticism
    1. The Demise of Linguistic Philosophy
    2. The Renaissance in Metaphysics
    3. The Renaissance in History
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. The Revolution of Moore and Russell: Cambridge Realism and The Linguistic Turn
    2. Russell and the Early Wittgenstein: Ideal Language and Logical Atomism
    3. Logical Positivism, the Vienna Circle, and Quine
    4. The Later Wittgenstein, et al.: Ordinary-Language Philosophy
    5. The 1960s and After: The Era of Eclecticism
    6. Critical and Historical Accounts of Analytic Philosophy
    7. Anthologies and General Introductions

1. The Revolution of Moore and Russell: Cambridge Realism and The Linguistic Turn

“It was towards the end of 1898,” wrote Bertrand Russell,

that Moore and I rebelled against both Kant and Hegel. Moore led the way, but I followed closely in his footsteps.... I felt…a great liberation, as if I had escaped from a hot house onto a windswept headland. In the first exuberance of liberation, I became a naïve realist and rejoiced in the thought that grass really is green. (Russell 1959, 22)

This important event in Russell’s own intellectual history turned out to be decisive for the history of twentieth-century philosophy as a whole; for it was this revolutionary break with British Idealism—then the most influential school of philosophical thought in the British universities—that birthed analytic philosophy and set it on the path to supplanting both Idealism and philosophy as traditionally conceived and practiced.

To understand Russell’s elation at the rebellion, one needs to know something about him and also something about British Idealism. Let’s begin with the latter.

At the end of the 19th century, F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, and J.M.E. McTaggart were the leading British Idealists. They claimed that the world, although it naively appears to us to be a collection of discrete objects (this bird, that table, the earth and the sun, and so forth), is really a single indivisible whole whose nature is mental, or spiritual, or Ideal rather than material. Thus, idealism was a brand of metaphysical monism, but not a form of materialism, the other leading form of metaphysical monism. It was also a form of what we would now call anti-realism, since it claimed that the world of naïve or ordinary experience is something of an illusion. Their claim was not that the objects of ordinary experience do not exist, but that they are not, as we normally take them to be, discrete. Instead, every object exists and is what it is at least partly in virtue of the relations it bears to other things—more precisely, to all other things. This was called the doctrine of internal relations. Since, on this view, everything that exists does so only in virtue of its relations to everything else, it is misleading to say of any one thing that it exists simpliciter. The only thing that exists simpliciter is the whole—the entire network of necessarily related objects. Correspondingly, the Idealists believed that no statement about some isolated object could be true simpliciter, since, on their view, to speak of an object in isolation would be to ignore the greater part of the truth about it, namely, its relations to everything else.

Analytic philosophy began when Moore and then Russell started to defend a thoroughgoing realism about what Moore called the “common sense” or “ordinary” view of the world. This involved a lush metaphysical pluralism, the belief that there are many things that exist simpliciter. It was not this pluralism, however, nor the content of any of his philosophical views, that inspired the analytic movement. Instead, it was the manner and idiom of Moore’s philosophizing. First, Moore rejected system-building or making grand syntheses of his views, preferring to focus on narrowly defined philosophical problems held in isolation. Second, when Moore articulated his realism, he did so in the idiom of “propositions” and “meanings.” There is a noteworthy ambiguity as to whether these are linguistic items or mental ones.

This terminology is further ambiguous in Moore’s case, for two reasons. First, his views about propositions are highly similar to a view standard in Austro-German philosophy from Bolzano and Lotze to Husserl according to which “propositions” and “meanings” have an Ideal existence—the kind of existence traditionally attributed to Platonic Forms. It is likely that Moore got the idea from reading in that tradition (cf. Bell 1999, Willard 1984). Second, despite strong similarities with the Austro-German view, it is clear that, in Moore’s early thought, “propositions” and “meanings” are primarily neither Ideal nor mental nor linguistic, but real in the sense of “thing-like.” For Moore and the early Russell, propositions or meanings were “identical” to ordinary objects—tables, cats, people. For more on this peculiar view, see the article on Moore, section 2b.

The deep metaphysical complexity attaching to Moore’s view was largely overlooked or ignored by his younger contemporaries, who were attracted to the form of his philosophizing rather than to its content. Taking the linguistic aspect of “propositions” and “meanings” to be paramount, they saw Moore as endorsing a linguistic approach to philosophy. This along with his penchant for attending to isolated philosophical problems rather than constructing a grand system, gave rise to the notion that he had rebelled not merely against British Idealism but against traditional philosophy on the grand scale.

Though Moore was later to object that there was nothing especially linguistic about it (see Moore 1942b), the linguistic conception of Moore’s method was far from baseless. For instance, in a famous paper called “A Defense of Common Sense” (Moore 1925), Moore seems to argue that the common sense view of the world is built into the terms of our ordinary language, so that if some philosopher wants to say that some common sense belief is false, he thereby disqualifies the very medium in which he expresses himself, and so speaks either equivocally or nonsensically.

His case begins with the observation that we know many things despite the fact that we do not know how we know them. Among these “beliefs of common sense,” as he calls them, are such propositions as “There exists at present a living human body, which is my body,” “Ever since it [this body] was born, it has been either in contact with or not far from the surface of the earth,” and “I have often perceived both body and other things which formed part of its environment, including other human bodies” (Moore 1925; in Moore 1959: 33). We can call these common sense propositions.

Moore argues that each common sense proposition has an “ordinary meaning” that specifies exactly what it is that one knows when one knows that proposition to be true. This “ordinary meaning” is perfectly clear to most everyone, except for some skeptical philosophers who

seem to think that [for example] the question “Do you believe that the earth has existed for many years past?” is not a plain question, such as should be met either by a plain “Yes” or “No,” or by a plain “I can’t make up my mind,” but is the sort of question which can be properly met by: “It all depends on what you mean by ‘the earth’ and ‘exists’ and ‘years’….” (Moore 1925; in 1959: 36)

Moore thought that to call common sense into question this way is perverse because the ordinary meaning of a common sense proposition is plain to all competent language-users. So, to question its meaning, and to suggest it has a different meaning, is disingenuous. Moreover, since the bounds of intelligibility seem to be fixed by the ordinary meanings of common sense proposition, the philosopher must accept them as starting points for philosophical reflection. Thus, the task of the philosopher is not to question the truth of common sense propositions, but to provide their correct analyses or explanations.

Moore’s use of the term “analysis” in this way is the source of the name “analytic philosophy.” Early on in analytic history, Moorean analysis was taken to be a matter of rephrasing some common sense proposition so as to yield greater insight into its already-clear and unquestionable meaning. For example, just as one elucidates the meaning of “brother” by saying a brother is a male sibling or by saying it means “male sibling,” so one might say that seeing a hand means experiencing a certain external object—which is exactly what Moore claims in his paper “Proof of an External World” (Moore 1939).

The argument of that essay runs as follows. “Here is one hand” is a common sense proposition with an ordinary meaning. Using it in accordance with that meaning, presenting the hand for inspection is sufficient proof that the proposition is true—that there is indeed a hand there. But a hand, according to the ordinary meaning of “hand,” is a material object, and a material object, according to the ordinary meaning of “material object,” is an external object, an object that isn’t just in our mind. Thus, since we can prove that there is a hand there, and since a hand is an external object, there is an external world, according to the ordinary meaning of “external world.”

These examples are from papers written in the second half of Moore’s career, but his “linguistic method” can be discerned much earlier, in works dating all the way back to the late 1800s—the period of his rebellion against Idealism. Even in Moore’s first influential paper, “The Nature of Judgment” (Moore 1899), he can be found paying very close attention to propositions and their meanings. In his celebrated paper, “The Refutation of Idealism” (Moore 1903b), Moore uses linguistic analysis to argue against the Idealist’s slogan Esse est percipi (to be is to be perceived). Moore reads the slogan as a definition or, as he would later call it, an analysis: just as we say “bachelor” means “unmarried man,” so the Idealist says “to exist” means “to be cognized.” However, if these bits of language had the same meaning, Moore argues, it would be superfluous to assert that they were identical, just as it is superfluous to say “a bachelor is a bachelor.” The fact that the Idealist sees some need to assert the formula reveals that there is a difference in meanings of “to be” and “to be perceived,” and hence a difference in the corresponding phenomena as well.

Moore’s most famous meaning-centered argument is perhaps the “open question argument” of his Principia Ethica (Moore 1903a). The open question argument purports to show that it is a mistake to define “good” in terms of anything other than itself. For any definition of good—“goodness is pleasure,” say—it makes sense to ask whether goodness really is pleasure (or whatever it has been identified with); thus, every attempt at definition leaves it an open question as to what good really is. This is so because every purported definition fails to capture the meaning of “good.”

All of these cases exhibit what proved to be the most influential aspect of Moore’s philosophical work, namely his method of analysis, which many of his contemporaries took to be linguistic analysis. For instance, Norman Malcolm represents the standard view of Moore for much of the twentieth century when he says that “the essence of Moore’s technique of refuting philosophical statements consists in pointing out that these statements go against ordinary language” (Malcolm 1942, 349). In the same essay, he goes on to tie Moore’s entire philosophical legacy to his “linguistic method:”

Moore’s great historical role consists in the fact that he has been perhaps the first philosopher to sense that any philosophical statement that violates ordinary language is false, and consistently to defend ordinary language against its philosophical violators. (Malcolm 1942, 368)

Malcolm is right to note the novelty of Moore’s approach. Although previous philosophers occasionally had philosophized about language, and had, in their philosophizing, paid close attention to the way language was used, none had ever claimed that philosophizing itself was merely a matter of analyzing language. Of course, Moore did not make this claim either, but what Moore actually did as a philosopher seemed to make saying it superfluous—in practice, he seemed to be doing exactly what Malcolm said he was doing. Thus, though it took some time for the philosophical community to realize it, it eventually became clear that this new “linguistic method,” pioneered by Moore, constituted a radical break not only with the British Idealists but with the larger philosophical tradition itself. To put it generally, philosophy was traditionally understood as the practice of reasoning about the world. Its goal was to give a logos—a rationally coherent account—of the world and its parts at various levels of granularity, but ultimately as a whole and at the most general level. There were other aspects of the project, too, of course, but this was the heart of it. With Moore, however, philosophy seemed to be recast as the practice of linguistic analysis applied to isolated issues. Thus, the rise of analytic philosophy, understood as the relatively continuous growth of a new philosophical school originating in Moore’s “linguistic turn,” was eventually recognized as being not just the emergence of another philosophical school, but as constituting a “revolution in philosophy” at large. (See Ayer et al. 1963 and Tugendhat 1982.)

2. Russell and the Early Wittgenstein: Ideal Language and Logical Atomism

The second phase of analytic philosophy is charaterized by the turn to ideal language analysis and, along with it, logical atomism—a metaphysical system developed by Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Russell laid the essential groundwork for both in his pioneering work in formal logic, which is covered in Sections 2a and 2b. Though this work was done during the first phase of analytic philosophy (1900-1910), it colaesced into a system only toward the end of that period, as Russell and Whitehead completed their work on the monumental Principia Mathematica (Russell and Whitehead 1910-13), and as Russell began to work closely with Ludwig Wittgenstein.

Wittgenstein seems to have been the sine qua non of the system. Russell was the first to use the term “logical atomism,” in a 1911 lecture to the French Philosophical Society. He was also the first to publicly provide a full-length, systematic treatment of it, in his 1918 lectures on “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism” (Russell 1918-19). However, despite the centrality of Russell’s logical work for the system, in the opening paragraph of these lectures Russell acknowedges that they “are very largely concerned with explaining certain ideas which I learnt from my friend and former pupil Ludwig Wittgenstein” (Russell 1918, 35). Wittgenstein's own views are recorded in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. First published in 1921, the Tractatus proved to be the most influential piece written on logical atomism. Because of its influence, we shall pay special attention to the Tractatus when it comes to presenting logical atomism as a complete system in Section 2d.

Though Russell and Wittgenstein differed over some of the details of logical atomism, these disagreements can be ignored for present purposes. What mattered for the development of analytic philosophy on the whole was the emergence in the second decade of the twentieth century of a new view of reality tailored to fit recent developments in formal logic and the philosophical methodology connected to it, as discussed in Section 2b. This was the common core of the Russellian and Wittegensteinian versions of logical atomism; thus, blurring the lines between Russell and Wittgenstein actually enables us to maintain better focus on the emerging analytic tradition. It will also make convenient a brief word on Frege, to see why some have wanted to include him as a founder of analytic philosophy (Section 2c).

a. The Theory of Descriptions

Much of Russell’s exuberance over Moore’s realism had to do with its consequences for logic and mathematics. Like so many philosophers before him, Russell was attracted to the objective certainty of mathematical and logical truths. However, because Idealism taught that no proposition about a bit of reality in isolation could be true simpliciter, an apparently straightforward truth such as 2+2=4, or If a=b and b=c then a=c, was not so straightforward after all. Even worse, Idealism made such truths dependent upon their being thought or conceived. This follows from the doctrine of internal relations; for, on the natural assumption that knowledge is or involves a relation between a knower (subject) and something known (object), the doctrine implies that objects of knowledge are not independent of the subjects that know them. This left Idealism open to the charge of endorsing psychologism—the view that apparently objective truths are to be accounted for in terms of the operations of subjective cognitive or “psychological” faculties. Psychologism was common to nearly all versions of Kantian and post-Kantian Idealism (including British Idealism). It was also a common feature of thought in the British empirical tradition, from Hume to Mill (albeit with a naturalistic twist). Moore’s early realism allowed Russell to avoid psychologism and other aspects of Idealism that prevented treating logical and mathematical truths as absolutely true in themselves.

A crucial part of this early realism, however, was the object theory of meaning; and this had implications that Russell found unacceptable. On the object theory, the meaning of a sentence is the object or state of affairs to which it refers (this is one reason why Moore could identify ordinary objects as propositions or meanings; see Section 1). For instance, the sentence “That leaf is green” is meaningful in virtue of bearing a special relationship to the state of affairs it is about, namely, a certain leaf’s being green.

This may seem plausible at first glance; problems emerge, however, when one recognizes that the class of meaningful sentences includes many that, from an empirical point of view, lack objects. Any statement referring to something that does not exist, such as a fictional character in a novel, will have this problem. A particularly interesting species of this genus is the negative existential statement—statements that express the denial of their subjects’ existence. For example, when we say “The golden mountain does not exist,” we seem to refer to a golden mountain—a nonexistent object—in the very act of denying its existence. But, on the object theory, if this sentence is to be meaningful, it must have an object to serve as its meaning. Thus it seems that the object theorist is faced with a dilemma: either give-up the object theory of meaning or postulate a realm of non-empirical objects that stand as the meanings of these apparently objectless sentences.

The Austrian philosopher Alexius Meinong took the latter horn of the dilemma, notoriously postulating a realm of non-existent objects. This alternative was too much for Russell. Instead, he found a way of going between the horns of the dilemma. His escape route was called the “theory of descriptions,” a bit of creative reasoning that the logician F. P. Ramsey called a “paradigm of philosophy,” and one which helped to stimulate extraordinary social momentum for the budding analytic movement. The theory of descriptions appears in Russell’s 1905 essay, “On Denoting,” which has become a central text in the analytic canon. There, Russell argues that “denoting phrases”—phrases that involve a noun preceded by “a,” “an,” “some,” “any,” “every,” “all,” or “the”—are incomplete symbols; that is, they have no meaning on their own, but only in the context of a complete sentence that expresses a proposition. Such sentences can be rephrased—analyzed in Moore’s sense of “analyzed”—into sentences that are meaningful and yet do not refer to anything nonexistent.

For instance, according to Russell, saying “The golden mountain does not exist” is really just a misleading way of saying “It is not the case that there is exactly one thing that is a mountain and is golden.” Thus analyzed, it becomes clear that the proposition does not refer to anything, but simply denies an existential claim. Since it does not refer to any “golden mountain,” it does not need a Meinongian object to provide it with meaning. In fact, taking the latter formulation to be the true logical form of the statement, Russell construes the original’s reference to a non-existent golden mountain as a matter of grammatical illusion. One dispels the illusion by making the grammatical form match the true logical form, and this is done through logical analysis. The idea that language could cast illusions that needed to be dispelled, some form of linguistic analysis was to be a prominent theme in analytic philosophy, both in its ideal language and ordinary language camps, through roughly 1960.

b. Ideal-Language Philosophy vs. Ordinary-Language Philosophy

Russellian analysis has just been just identified as logical rather than linguistic analysis, and yet it was said in a previous paragraph that this was analysis in the sense made familiar by Moore. In truth, there were both significant similarities and significant differences between Moorean and Russellian analysis. On the one hand, Russellian analysis was like Moore’s in that it involved the rephrasing of a sentence into another sentence semantically equivalent but grammatically different. On the other hand, Russell’s analyses were not given in ordinary language, as Moore’s were. Instead, they were given in symbolic logic, that is, in a quasi-mathematical, symbolic notation that made the structure of Russell’s analyzed propositions exceedingly clear. For instance, with the definitions of Mx as “x is a mountain” and Gx as “x is golden,” the proposition that the golden mountain does not exist becomes

~[(∃x)(Mx & Gx) & ∀y((My & Gy) → y=x)]

Equivalently, in English, it is not the case that there is some object such that (1) it is a mountain, (2) it is golden, and (3) all objects that are mountains and golden are identical to it. (For more on what this sort of notation looks like and how it works, see the article on Propositional Logic, especially Section 3.)

By 1910, Russell, along with Alfred North Whitehead, had so developed this symbolic notation and the rules governing its use that it constituted a fairly complete system of formal logic. This they published in the three volumes of their monumental Principia Mathematica (Russell and Whitehead 1910-1913).

Within the analytic movement, the Principia was received as providing an ideal language, capable of elucidating all sorts of ordinary-language confusions. Consequently, Russellian logical analysis was seen as a new species of the genus linguistic analysis, which had already been established by Moore. Furthermore, many took logical analysis to be superior to Moore’s ordinary-language analysis insofar as its results (its analyses) were more exact and not themselves prone to further misunderstandings or illusions.

The distinction between ordinary-language philosophy and ideal-language philosophy formed the basis for a fundamental division within the analytic movement through the early 1960s. The introduction of logical analysis also laid the groundwork for logical atomism, a new metaphysical system developed by Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Before we discuss this directly, however, we must say a word about Gottlob Frege.

c. Frege: Influence or Instigator?

In developing the formal system of Principia Mathematica, Russell relied heavily on the work of several forebears including the German mathematician and philosopher Gottlob Frege. A generation before Russell and the Principia, Frege had provided his own system of formal logic, with its own system of symbolic notation. Frege’s goal in doing so was to prove logicism, the view that mathematics is reducible to logic. This was also Russell’s goal in the Principia. (For more on the development of logic in the late 19th and early 20th centuries, see the article on Propositional Logic, especially Section 2). Frege also anticipated Russell’s notion of incomplete symbols by invoking what has come to be called “the context principle:” words have meaning only in the context of complete sentences.

Frege’s focus on the formalization and symbolization of logic naturally led him into terrain that we would now classify as falling under the philosophy of language, and to approach certain philosophical problems as if they were problems about language, or at least as if they could be resolved by linguistic means. This has led some to see in Frege a linguistic turn similar to that perceivable in the early work of Moore and Russell (on this point, see the article on Frege and Language).

Because of these similarities and anticipations, and because Russell explicitly relied on Frege’s work, many have seen Frege as a founder of analytic philosophy more or less on a par with Moore and Russell (See Dummett 1993 and Kenny 2000). Others see this as an exaggeration both of Frege’s role and of the similarities between him and other canonical analysts. For instance, Peter Hacker notes that Frege was not interested in reforming philosophy the way all the early analysts were:

Frege’s professional life was a single-minded pursuit of a demonstration that arithmetic had its foundations in pure logic alone … One will search Frege’s works in vain for a systematic discussion of the nature of philosophy. (Hacker 1986: 5, 7)

There is no doubt that Frege’s views proved crucially useful and inspiring to key players on the ideal-language side of analytic philosophy. Whether or not this qualifies him as a founder of analytic philosophy depends on the extent to which we see the analytic movement as born of a desire for metaphilosophical revolution on the grand scale. To the extent that this is essential to our understanding of analytic philosophy, Frege’s role will be that of an influence rather than a founder.

d. Logical Atomism and Wittgenstein’s Tractatus

Ludwig Wittgenstein came to Cambridge to study mathematical logic under Russell, but he quickly established himself as his teacher’s intellectual peer. Together, they devised a metaphysical system called “logical atomism.” As discussed at the beginning of Section 2, qua total system, logical atomism seems to have been Wittgenstein’s brainchild. Still, this should not be seen as in any way marginalizing Russell’s significance for the system, which can be described as a metaphysics based on the assumption that an ideal language the likes of which was provided in Principia Mathematica is the key to reality.

According to logical atomism, propositions are built out of elements corresponding to the basic constituents of the world, just as sentences are built out of words. The combination of words in a meaningful sentence mirrors the combination of constituents in the corresponding proposition and also in the corresponding possible or actual state of affairs. That is, the structure of every possible or actual state of affairs is isomorphic with both the structure of the proposition that refers to it and the structure of the sentence that expresses that proposition--so long as the sentence is properly formulated in the notation of symbolic logic. The simplest sort of combination is called an atomic fact because this fact has no sub-facts as part of its structure. An atomic fact for some logical atomists might be something like an individual having a property—a certain leaf’s being green, for instance. Linguistically, this fact is represented by an atomic proposition: for example, “this leaf is green,” or, in logical symbolism “F(a).” Both the fact F(a) and the proposition “F(a)” are called “atomic” not because they themselves are atomic [that is, without structure], but because all their constituents are. Atomic facts are the basic constituents of the world, and atomic propositions are the basic constituents of language.

More complex propositions representing more complex facts are called molecular propositions and molecular facts.  The propositions are made by linking atomic propositions together with truth-functional connectives, such as “and,” “or” and “not.” A truth-functional connective is one that combines constituent propositions in such a way that their truth-values (that is, their respective statuses as true or false) completely determine the truth value of the resulting molecular proposition. For instance, the truth value of a proposition of the form “not-p” can be characterized in terms of, and hence treated as determined by, the truth value of “p” because if “p” is true, then “not-p” is false, and if it is false, “not-p” is true. Similarly, a proposition of the form “p and q” will be true if and only if its constituent propositions “p” and “q” are true on their own.

The logic of Principia Mathematica is entirely truth-functional; that is, it only allows for molecular propositions whose truth-values are determined by their atomic constituents. Thus, as Russell observed in the introduction to the second edition of the Principia, “given all true atomic propositions, together with the fact that they are all, every other true proposition can theoretically be deduced by logical methods” (Russell 1925, xv). The same assumption—called the thesis of truth-functionality or the thesis of extensionality—lies behind Wittgenstien’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus.

As mentioned previously, Wittgenstein’s Tractatus proved to be the most influential expression of logical atomism. The Tractatus is organized around seven propositions, here taken from the 1922 translation by C. K. Ogden:

  1. The world is everything that is the case.
  2. What is the case, the fact, is the existence of atomic facts.
  3. The logical picture of the facts is the thought.
  4. The thought is the significant proposition.
  5. Propositions are truth-functions of elementary propositions. (An elementary proposition is a truth function of itself.)
  6. The general form of a truth-function is.... This is the general form of a proposition.
  7. Whereof one cannot speak, thereof one must be silent.

The body of the Tractatus consists in cascading levels of numbered elaborations of these propositions (1 is elaborated by 1.1 which is elaborated by 1.11, 1.12 and 1.13, and so forth)—except for 7, which stands on its own. Propositions 1 and 2 establish the metaphysical side of logical atomism: the world is nothing but a complex of atomic facts. Propositions 3 and 4 establish the isomorphism between language and reality: a significant (meaningful) proposition is a "logical picture" of the facts that constitute some possible or actual state of affairs. It is a picture in the sense that the structure of the proposition is identical to the structure of the corresponding atomic facts. It is here, incidentally, that we get the first explicit statement of the metaphilosophical view characteristic of early analytic philosophy: “All philosophy is a ‘critique of language’ ...” (4.0031).

Proposition 5 asserts the thesis of truth-functionality, the view that all complex propositions are built out of atomic propositions joined by truth-functional connectives, and that atomic propositions are truth-functional in themselves. Even existentially quantified propositions are considered to be long disjunctions of atomic propositions. It has since been recognized that a truth-functional logic is not adequate to capture all the phenomena of the world; or at least that, if there is an adequate truth-functional system, we haven't found it yet. Certain phenomena seem to defy truth-functional characterization; for instance, moral facts are problematic. Knowing whether the constituent proposition “p” is true, doesn’t seem to tell us whether “It ought to be the case that p” is true. Similarly problematical are facts about thoughts, beliefs, and other mental states (captured in statements such as “John believes that…”), and modal facts (captured in statements about the necessity or possibility of certain states of affairs). And treating existential quantifiers as long disjunctions doesn’t seem to be adequate for the infinite number of facts about numbers since there surely are more real numbers than there are available names to name them even if we were willing to accept infinitely long disjunctions. The hope that truth-functional logic will prove adequate for resolving all these problems has inspired a good bit of thinking in the analytic tradition, especially during the first half of the twentieth century. This hope lies at the heart of logical atomism.

In its full form, Proposition 6 includes some unusual symbolism that is not reproduced here.  All it does, however, is to give a general “recipe” for the creation of molecular propositions by giving the general form of a truth-function. Basically, Wittgenstein is saying that all propositions are truth-functional, and that, ultimately, there is only one kind of truth-function. Principia Mathematica had employed a number of truth-functional connectives: “and,” “or,” “not,” and so forth.  However, in 1913 a logician named Henry Sheffer showed that propositions involving these connectives could be rephrased (analyzed) as propositions involving a single connective consisting in the negation of a conjunction. This was called the “not and” or “nand” connective, and was supposed to be equivalent to the ordinary language formulation “not both x and y.” It is usually symbolized by a short vertical line ( | ) called the Sheffer stroke. Though Wittgenstein uses his own idiosyncratic symbolism, this is the operation identified in proposition 6 and some of its elaborations as showing the general form of a truth-function. Replacing the Principia’s plurality of connectives with the “nand” connective made for an extremely minimalistic system—all one needed to construct a complete picture/description of the world was a single truth-functional connective applied repeatedly to the set of all atomic propositions.

Proposition 7, which stands on its own, is the culmination of a series of observations made throughout the Tractatus, and especially in the elaborations of proposition 6. Throughout the Tractatus there runs a distinction between showing and saying. Saying is a matter of expressing a meaningful proposition. Showing is a matter of presenting something’s form or structure. Thus, as Wittgenstein observes at 4.022, “A proposition shows its sense. A proposition shows how things stand if it is true. And it says that they do so stand.”

In the introduction to the Tractatus, Wittgenstein indicates that his overarching purpose is to set the criteria and limits of meaningful saying. The structural aspects of language and the world—those aspects that are shown—fall beyond the limits of meaningful saying. According to Wittgenstein, the propositions of logic and mathematics are purely structural and therefore meaningless—they show the form of all possible propositions/states of affairs, but they do not themselves picture any particular state of affairs, thus they do not say anything. This has the odd consequence that the propositions of the Tractatus themselves, which are supposed to be about logic, are meaningless. Hence the famous dictum at 6.54:

My propositions are elucidatory in this way: he who understands me finally recognizes them as senseless, when he has climbed out through them, on them, over them. (He must so to speak throw away the ladder, after he has climbed up on it.) He must transcend these propositions, and then he will see the world aright.

Though meaningless, the propositions of logic and mathematics are not nonsense. They at least have the virtue of showing the essential structure of all possible facts. On the other hand, there are concatenations of words, purported propositions, that neither show nor say anything and thus are not connected to reality in any way. Such propositions are not merely senseless, they are nonsense. Among nonsense propositions are included the bulk of traditional philosophical statements articulating traditional philosophical problems and solutions, especially in metaphysics and ethics. This is the consequence of Wittgenstein’s presumption that meaningfulness is somehow linked to the realm of phenomena studied by the natural sciences (cf. 4.11 ff). Thus, as he claims in 6.53:

The correct method in philosophy would really be the following: to say nothing except what can be said, that is propositions of natural science—that is something that has nothing to do with philosophy—and then, whenever someone else wanted to say something metaphysical, to demonstrate to him that he had failed to give a meaning to certain signs in his propositions.

In the eyes of its author (as he avers in its Introduction), the real accomplishment of the Tractatus was to have solved, or rather dissolved, all the traditional problems of philosophy by showing that they were meaningless conundrums generated by a failure to understand the limits of meaningful discourse.

3. Logical Positivism, the Vienna Circle, and Quine

a. Logical Positivism and the Vienna Circle

Logical positivism is the result of combining the central aspects of the positivisms of Auguste Comte and Ernst Mach with the meta-philosophical and methodological views of the analytic movement, especially as understood by the ideal-language camp. In all its forms, positivism was animated by the idealization of scientific knowledge as it was commonly understood from at least the time of Newton through the early twentieth century. Consequently, at its core is a view called scientism: the view that all knowledge is scientific knowledge.

As twentieth-century philosophy of science has shown, the definition and demarcation of science is a very difficult task. Still, for several centuries it has been common to presume that metaphysics and other branches of philosophy-as-traditionally-practiced, not to mention religious and “common sense” beliefs, do not qualify as scientific. From the standpoint of scientism, these are not fields of knowledge, and their claims should not be regarded as carrying any serious weight.

At the heart of logical positivism was a novel way of dismissing certain non-scientific views by declaring them not merely wrong or false, but meaningless. According to the verification theory of meaning, sometimes also called the empiricist theory of meaning, any non-tautological statement has meaning if and only if it can be empirically verified. This “verification principle” of meaning is similar to the principle maintained in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus that the realm of meaning is coextensive with the realm of the natural (empirical) sciences. In fact the logical positivists drew many of their views straight from the pages of the Tractatus (though their reading of it has since been criticized as being too inclined to emphasize the parts friendly to scientific naturalism at the expense of those less-friendly). With Wittgenstein, the logical positivists concluded that the bulk of traditional philosophy consisted in meaningless pseudo-problems generated by the misuse of language, and that the true role of philosophy was to establish and enforce the limits of meaningful language through linguistic analysis.

Logical positivism was created and promoted mainly by a number of Austro-German thinkers associated with the Vienna Circle and, to a lesser extent, the Berlin Circle. The Vienna Circle began as a discussion group of scientifically-minded philosophers—or perhaps philosophically minded-scientists—organized by Moritz Schlick in 1922. Its exact membership is difficult to determine, since there were a number of peripheral figures who attended its meetings or at least had substantial connections to core members, but who are frequently characterized as visitors or associates rather than full-fledged members. Among its most prominent members were Schlick himself, Otto Neurath, Herbert Feigl, Freidrich Waismann and, perhaps most prominent of all, Rudolph Carnap. The members of both Circles made contributions to a number of different philosophical and scientific discussions, including logic and the philosophy of mind (see for example this Encyclopedia’s articles on Behaviorism and Identity Theory); however, their most important contributions vis-à-vis the development of analytic philosophy were in the areas of the philosophy of language, philosophical methodology and metaphilosophy. It was their views in these areas that combined to form logical positivism.

Logical positivism was popularized in Britain by A.J. Ayer, who visited with the Vienna Circle in 1933. His book Language, Truth and Logic (Ayer 1936) was extremely influential, and remains the best introduction to logical positivism as understood in its heyday. To escape the turmoil of World War II, several members of the Vienna Circle emigrated to the United States where they secured teaching posts and exercised an immense influence on academic philosophy. By this time, however, logical positivism was largely past its prime; consequently, it was not so much logical positivism proper that was promulgated, but something more in the direction of philosophizing focused on language, logic, and science. (For more on this point, see the article on American Philosophy, especially Section 4).

Ironically, the demise of logical positivism was caused mainly by a fatal flaw in its central view, the verification theory of meaning. According to the verification principle, a non-tautological statement has meaning if and only if it can be empirically verified. However, the verification principle itself is non-tautological but cannot be empirically verified. Consequently, it renders itself meaningless. Even apart from this devastating problem, there were difficulties in setting the scope of the principle so as to properly subserve the positivists’ scientistic aims. In its strong form (given above), the principle undermined not only itself, but also statements about theoretical entities, so necessary for science to do its work. On the other hand, weaker versions of the principle, such as that given in the second edition of Ayer’s Language, Truth, and Logic (1946), were incapable of eliminating the full range of metaphysical and other non-scientific statements that the positivists wanted to disqualify.

b. W. V. Quine

Willard Van Orman Quine was the first American philosopher of any great significance in the analytic tradition. Though his views had their greatest impact only as the era of linguistic philosophy came to an end, it is convenient to take them up in contrast with logical positivism.

An important part of the logical positivist program was the attempt to analyze or reduce scientific statements into so-called protocol statements having to do with empirical observations. This reductionist project was taken up by several members of the Vienna Circle, but none took it so far as did Rudolph Carnap, in his The Logical Structure of the World (1928) and in subsequent work.

The basic problem for the reductionist project is that many important scientific claims and concepts seem to go beyond what can be verified empirically. Claiming that the sun will come up tomorrow is a claim the goes beyond today’s observations. Claims about theoretical entities such as atoms also provide obvious cases of going beyond what can be verified by specific observations, but statements of scientific law run into essentially the same problem. Assuming empiricism, what is required to place scientific claims on a secure, epistemic foundation is to eliminate the gap between observation and theory without introducing further unverifiable entities or views. This was the goal of the reductionist project. By showing that every apparently unverifiable claim in science could be analyzed into a small set of observation-sentences, the logical positivists hoped to show that the gap between observation and theory does not really exist.

Despite being on very friendly terms with Carnap and other members of the Vienna Circle (with whom he visited in the early 1930s), and despite being dedicated, as they were, to scientism and empiricism, Quine argued that the reductionist project was hopeless. “Modern Empiricism,” he claimed,

has been conditioned in large part by two dogmas. One is a belief in some fundamental cleavage between truths which are analytic, or grounded in meanings independently of matters of fact, and truths which are synthetic, or grounded in fact. The other dogma is reductionism: the belief that each meaningful statement is equivalent to some logical construct upon terms which refer to immediate experience. (Quine 1951, 20)

“Both dogmas,” says Quine, “are ill-founded.”

The first dogma with which Quine is concerned is that there is an important distinction to be made between analytic and synthetic claims. Traditionally, the notions of analytic truth, a priori truth, and necessary truth have been closely linked to one another, forming a conceptual network that stands over against the supposedly contradictory network of a posterioricontingent, and synthetic truths. Each of these categories will be explained briefly prior to addressing Quine’s critique of this “dogma” (for a more extensive treatment see the article on A Priori and A Posteriori).

An a priori truth is a proposition that can be known to be true by intuition or pure reason, without making empirical observations. For instance, neither mathematical truths such as 2+2=4, nor logical truths such as If ((a=b) &(b=c)) then (a=c), nor semantic truths such as All bachelors are unmarried men, depend upon the realization of any corresponding, worldly state of affairs, either in order to be true or to be known.  A posteriori truths, on the other hand, are truths grounded in or at least known only by experience, including both mundane truths such as The cat is on the mat and scientific truths such as Bodies in free-fall accelerate at 9.8 m/s2.

Many (if not all) a priori truths seem to be necessary—that is, they could not have been otherwise. On the other hand, many (if not all) a posteriori truths seem to be contingent—that is, that they could have been otherwise: the cat might not have been on the mat, and, for all we know, the rate of acceleration for bodies in freefall might have been different than what it is.

Finally, the necessity and a prioricity of such truths seem to be linked to their analyticity. A proposition is analytically true if the meanings of its terms require it to be true. For example, the proposition “All bachelors are men” is analytically true, because “man” is connected to “bachelor" in virtue of its meaning—a fact recognized by analyzing “bachelor” so as to see that it means “unmarried man”. On the other hand, “All bachelors have left the room” is not analytically true. It is called a synthetic proposition or truth, because it involves terms or concepts that are not connected analytically by their individual meanings, but only insofar as they are synthesized (brought together) in the proposition itself. Such truths are usually, and perhaps always, a posteriori and contingent.

Historically, philosophers have tended to try to explain necessity, a prioricity and analyticity by appealing to abstract objects such as Plato’s Forms or Aristotle’s essences. Such entities purportedly transcend the realm of time, space, and/or the senses, and hence the realm of “nature” as defined by science—at least as this was understood by the scientific naturalism of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. Consequently, devotees of scientific naturalism required an alternative account of necessity, a priority, and analyticity; and here analytic philosophy’s linguistic turn seemed to offer a way forward.

For obvious reasons, and as the above quotation from Quine hints, analytic truths traditionally have been characterized as “true in virtue of meaning.” However, historically, “meaning” has been cashed out in different ways: in terms of abstract, Ideal entities (Plato, Aristotle, Husserl), and in terms of concepts (Locke, Hume), and in terms of language (construed as a system of concrete, sensible symbols with conventionally approved uses). In the context of analytic philosophy’s “linguistic turn,” it was all too easy to take the latter approach, and hence to treat analyticity as deriving from some linguistic phenomenon such as synonymy or the interchangeability of terms.

Such a view was highly amenable to the scientistic, naturalistic, and empiricistic leanings of many early analysts, and especially to the logical positivists. On the assumptions that meaning is fundamentally linguistic and that language is a conventional symbol-system in which the symbols are assigned meanings by fiat, one can explain synonymy without referring to anything beyond the realm of time, space and the senses. If one can then explain analyticity in terms of synonymy, and explain both necessity and a prioricity in terms of analyticity, then one will have theories of analytic, necessary, and a priori truths consistent with scientific naturalism.

Given Quine’s own commitment to scientific naturalism, one might have expected him to join the logical positivists and others in embracing this model and then striving for a workable version of it. However, Quine proposed a more radical solution to the scientific naturalist’s problem with necessity, a prioricity, and analyticity: namely, he proposed to reject the distinctions between analytic and synthetic, a priori and a posteriori, necessary and contingent.

He begins undermining the notion that synonymy-relations are established by fiat or “stipulative definition.” On the naturalistic view of language and meaning, all meanings and synonymy relations would have to have been established by some person or people making stipulative definitions at some particular place and time. For instance, someone would have had to have said, at some point in history, “henceforth, the symbol ‘bachelor’ shall be interchangeable with the symbol ‘unmarried man’.” However, Quine asks rhetorically, “who defined it thus, or when?” (Quine 1951, 24). The point is that we have no evidence of this ever having happened. Thus, at the very least, the naturalistic account of meaning/synonymy is an unverifiable theory of the sort the positivists wanted to avoid. Moreover, what empirical evidence we do have suggests that it is likely false, for, as Quine sees it, “definition—except in the extreme case of the explicitly conventional introduction of new notation—hinges on prior relationships of synonymy” (Quine 1951, 27). In cases where it appears that someone is making a stipulative definition—as in a dictionary, for example—Quine explains that, far from establishing synonymy, the stipulator is either describing or making use of synonymy relations already present in the language. After exploring several kinds of cases in which stipulative definitions seem to establish synonymy relations, he concludes that all but one—the banal act of coining an abbreviation—rely on pre-existing synonymy relations. The upshot is that stipulative definition cannot account for the breadth of cases in which synonymy is exemplified, and thus that it cannot be the general ground of either synonymy or analyticity.

With its foundation thus undermined, the naturalistic theory of analyticity, necessity and a prioricity collapses. However, rather than rejecting naturalism on account of its inability to explain these phenomena, Quine rejects the notion that naturalism needs to explain them on the ground that they are spurious categories. Prima facie, of course, there seems to be a distinction between the analytic and the synthetic, the a priori and the a posteriori, the necessary and the contingent. However, when we attempt to get a deeper understanding of these phenomena by defining them, we cannot do it. Quine explores several other ways of defining analyticity in addition to synonymy and stipulative definition, ultimately concluding that none work. To the contrary, analyticity, synonymy, necessity and related concepts seem to contribute to each other’s meaning/definition in a way that “is not flatly circular, but something like it. It has the form, figuratively speaking, of a closed curve in space” (Quine 1951, 29). Because none of them can be defined without invoking one of the others, no one of them can be eliminated by reducing it to one of the others. Rather than concluding that analyticity, a prioricity, necessity, and so forth are primitive phenomena, Quine takes their indefinability to indicate that there is no genuine distinction to be drawn between them and their traditional opposites.

This brings us to the second dogma. When Quine criticizes “reductionism,” he has principally in mind the logical positivists’ tendency to pursue the reductionist project as if every and any scientific statement, considered in isolation, could be reduced to/analyzed into a small set of observational statements related to it in such a way that they counted uniquely as that claim’s verification and meaning. Over against this “atomistic” or “isolationist” or “local” conception of verification/reductive analysis, Quine argued that scientific claims have predictive power, and hence verifiability or falsifiability, and hence also meaning, only as parts of large networks of claims that together form far-reaching theories that might be called “worldviews.” For this reason, one can never verify or falsify an isolated scientific claim; rather, verification and falsification—and hence also meaning—are holistic. Observations (and observation sentences) that may seem to verify a lone claim actually make a partial contribution to the verification of the total theoretical network to which it belongs.

As the language here suggests, viewed holistically, verification is never absolute. There is no manageable set of observations that will verify a total theory or any of its constitutive claims once and for all. By the same token, observations (and observation sentences) that may seem to falsify a lone claim do not decisively falsify either it or the theory to which it belongs. Rather, such observations require only that some adjustment be made to the theory. Perhaps one of its constitutive claims must be rejected, but not necessarily the one that initially seemed to be falsified. On Quine’s view, any constitutive claim can be saved by making adjustments elsewhere in the theory-network.

This holistic view of meaning and verification reinforces Quine’s rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction and its fellows. Holism in these areas implies that no claim in one’s total theory is immune from revision or rejection in light of observational evidence. This means that even claims traditionally thought to be necessary and/or analytic, such as those of mathematics and logic, can be revised or rejected in order to preserve other claims to which one is more deeply committed.

Quine’s assault on the analytic/synthetic distinction undermines not merely the positivists’ reductionist project, but also the general practice of analysis which, from the beginning, had been understood to involve the transformation of a sentence into another sentence semantically equivalent (synonymous) but grammatically different. At the same time, Quine’s holism about the meaning of scientific claims and their verification generalizes to become a theory of meaning holism that applies to all meaningful claims whatsoever. However, following Moore’s practice, the analytic method was usually applied to claims in isolation, apart from considerations of their connection to other claims that together might constitute a philosophical “worldview.” Quinean meaning holism undermines this aspect of analysis just as much as it does the logical positivists “isolationist” view of verification.

4. The Later Wittgenstein and Ordinary-Language Philosophy

a. Ordinary-Language Philosophy

Thanks to G.E. Moore, ordinary-language analysis had had a place in the analytic movement from the very beginning. Because of the perceived superiority of ideal-language analysis, however, it dropped almost completely out of sight for several decades. In the 1930s, ordinary-language analysis began to make a comeback thanks mainly to Wittgenstein—whose views had undergone radical changes during the 1920s—but also to a number of other talented philosophers including John Wisdom, John Austin (not to be confused with the nineteenth-century John Austin who invented legal positivism), Gilbert Ryle, Peter Strawson and Paul Grice. Despite differences in their reasons for adopting the ordinary-language approach as well as their respective manners of employing it, these figures’ common focus on ordinary language was a substantial point of unity over against the initially dominant ideal-language approach.

Ordinary-language philosophy became dominant in analytic philosophy only after World War II—hence the dates for the ordinary-language era given in the Introduction are 1945-1965. Indeed, with the exception of several articles by Ryle, the most important texts of the ordinary-language camp were published in 1949 and later—in some cases not until much later, when the linguistic approach to philosophy in all its forms was already on its way out.

Ordinary-language philosophy is sometimes called “Oxford philosophy.” This is because Ryle, Austin, Strawson and Grice were all Oxford dons. They were the most important representatives of the ordinary-language camp after Wittgenstein (who was at Cambridge).  After Wittgenstein died in the early years of the ordinary-language era, they lived to promote it through its heyday.

Despite the strong connection to Oxford, Wittgenstein is usually taken to be the most important of the ordinary-language philosophers. For this reason, we will focus only on his later views in giving a more detailed example of ordinary language philosophy.

b. The Later Wittgenstein

While logical positivism was busy crumbling under the weight of self-referential incoherence, a larger problem was brewing for ideal-language philosophy in general. After publishing the Tractatus, Wittgenstein retired from philosophy and went to teach grade-school in the Austrian countryside. Why wouldn’t he leave academia—after all, he believed he had already lain to rest all the traditional problems of philosophy!

During his time away from the academy, Wittgenstein had occasion to rethink his views about language. He concluded that, far from being a truth-functional calculus, language has no universally correct structure—that is, there is no such thing as an ideal language. Instead, each language-system—be it a full-fledged language, a dialect, or a specialized technical language used by some body of experts—is like a game that functions according to its own rules.

These rules are not of the sort found in grammar books—those are just attempts to describe rules already found in the practices of some linguistic community. Real linguistic rules, according to the later Wittgenstein, cannot be stated, but are rather shown in the complex intertwining of linguistic and non-linguistic practices that make up the “form of life” of any linguistic community. Language is, for the later Wittgenstein, an intrinsically social phenomenon, and its correct modes are as diverse as the many successful modes of corporate human life. Consequently, it cannot be studied in the abstract, apart from its many particular embodiments in human communities.

In contrast with his views in the Tractatus, the later Wittgenstein no longer believed that meaning is a picturing-relation grounded in the correspondence relationships between linguistic atoms and metaphysical atoms. Instead, language systems, or language games, are unanalyzable wholes whose parts (utterances sanctioned by the rules of the language) have meaning in virtue of having a role to play—a use—within the total form of life of a linguistic community. Thus it is often said that for the latter Wittgenstein meaning is use. On this view, the parts of a language need not refer or correspond to anything at all—they only have to play a role in a form of life.

It is important to note that even in his later thought, Wittgenstein retained the view that traditional philosophical problems arise from linguistic error, and that true philosophy is about analyzing language so as to grasp the limits of meaning and see that error for what it is—a headlong tumble into confusion or meaninglessness. However, his new understanding of language required a new understanding of analysis. No longer could it be the transformation of some ordinary language statement into the symbolic notation of formal logic purportedly showing its true form. Instead, it is a matter of looking at how language is ordinarily used and seeing that traditional philosophical problems arise only as we depart from that use.

“A philosophical problem,” says Wittgenstein, “has the form: ‘I don’t know my way about’” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶123), that is, I don’t know how to speak properly about this, to ask a question about this, to give an answer to that question. If I were to transcend the rules of my language and say something anyhow, what I say would be meaningless nonsense. Such are the utterances of traditional, metaphysical philosophy. Consequently, philosophical problems are to be solved, or rather dissolved,

by looking into the workings of our language, and that in such a way as to make us recognize its workings: … The problems are solved, not by giving new information, but by arranging what we have always known. (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 109)

And “what we have always known” is the rules of our language. “The work of the philosopher,” he says, “consists in assembling reminders for a particular purpose” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 127). These reminders take the form of examples of how the parts of language are ordinarily used in the language game out of which the philosoher has tried to step. Their purpose is to coax the philosopher away from the misuse of language essential to the pursuit of traditional philosophical questions. Thus the true philosophy becomes a kind of therapy aimed at curing a lingusitic disease that cripples one’s ability to fully engage in the form of life of one’s linguistic community. True philsophy, Wittgenstein says, “is a battle against the bewitchment of our intelligence by means of language” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 109). The true philosopher’s weapon in this battle is “to bring words back from their metaphysical to their everyday use” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 116), so that “the results of philosophy are the uncovering of one or another piece of plain nonsense and of bumps that the understanding has gotten by running its head up against the limits of language” (Wittgenstein 1953, ¶ 119).

Though Wittgenstein developed these new views much earlier (mainly in the 1920s and 30s), they were not officially published until 1953, in the posthumous Philosophical Investigations. Prior to this, Wittgenstein’s new views were spread largely by word of mouth among his students and other interested persons.

5. The 1960s and After: The Era of Eclecticism

a. The Demise of Linguistic Philosophy

By the mid-1960s the era of linguistic philosophy was coming to a close. The causes of its demise are variegated. For one thing, it was by this time apparent that there were deep divisions within the analytic movement, especially between the ordinary-language and ideal-language camps, over the nature of language and meaning on the one hand, and over how to do philosophy on the other. Up to this point, the core of analytic philosophy had been the view that philosophical problems are linguistic illusions generated by violating the boundaries of meaning, and that they were to be solved by clearly marking those boundaries and then staying within them. It was now becoming clear, however, that this was no easy task. Far from being the transparent phenomenon that the early analysts had taken it to be, linguistic meaning was turning out to be a very puzzling phenomenon, itself in need of deep, philosophical treatment.

Indeed, it was becoming clear that many who had held the core analytic view about the nature of philosophy had relied upon different theories of meaning sometimes implicit, never sufficiently clear, and frequently implausible. The internal failure of logical positivism combined with the external criticisms of Wittgenstein and Quine contributed to the demise of the ideal-language approach. On the other hand, many, including Bertrand Russell, saw the ordinary-language approach as falling far short of serious, philosophical work. For this and other reasons, the ordinary-language approach also drew fire from outside the analytic movement, in the form of Ernest Gellner’s Words and Things (1959) and W.C.K. Mundle’s Critique of Linguistic Philosophy (1970). The former especially had a large, international impact, thereby contributing to what T. P. Uschanov has called “the strange death of ordinary language philosophy.”

The waning of linguistic philosophy signaled also the waning of attempts to specify the proper philosophical method, or even just the method distinctive of analytic philosophy. Quine’s take on the matter—that philosophy is continuous with science in its aims and methods, differing only in the generality of its questions—proved influential and achieved a certain level of dominance for a time, but not to the extent that the linguistic conception of philosophy had during its sixty-year run. Alternatives tied less tightly to the empirical sciences soon emerged, with the result that philosophical practice in contemporary analytic philosophy is now quite eclectic. In some circles, the application of formal techniques is still regarded as central to philosophical practice, though this is now more likely to be regarded as a means of achieving clarity about our concepts than as a way of analyzing language. In other circles meticulous expression in ordinary language is seen to provide a sufficient level of clarity.

Partly because of Quine’s view of philosophy as continuous with science (which, of course, is divided into specializations), and partly because analytic philosophy had always been given to dealing with narrowly-defined questions in isolation from others, post-linguistic analytic philosophy partitioned itself into an ever-increasing number of specialized sub-fields. What had been linguistic philosophy metamorphosed into what we now know as the philosophy of language. Epistemology, the philosophy of mind, the philosophy of science, ethics and meta-ethics, and even metaphysics emerged or re-emerged as areas of inquiry not indifferent to linguistic concerns, but not themselves intrinsically linguistic. Over time, the list has expanded to include aesthetics, social and political philosophy, feminist philosophy, the philosophy of religion, philosophy of law, cognitive science, and the history of philosophy.

On account of its eclecticism, contemporary analytic philosophy defies summary or general description. By the same token, it encompasses far too much to discuss in any detail here. However, two developments in post-linguistic analytic philosophy require special mention.

b. The Renaissance in Metaphysics

Metaphysics has undergone a certain sort of renaissance in post-linguistic analytic philosophy. Although contemporary analytic philosophy does not readily countenance traditional system-building metaphysics (at least as a respected professional activity), it has embraced the piecemeal pursuit of metaphysical questions so wholeheartedly that metaphysics is now seen as one of its three most important sub-disciplines. (The other two are epistemology and the philosophy of language; all three are frequently referred to as “core” analytic areas or sub-disciplines.) This is noteworthy given analytic philosophy’s traditional anti-metaphysical orientation.

The return of metaphysics is due mainly to the collapse of those theories of meaning which originally had banned it as meaningless, but later developments in the philosophy of language also played a role. In the 1960s, the ordinary-language philosopher Peter Strawson began advocating for what he called “descriptive metaphysics,” a matter of looking to the structure and content of natural languages to illuminate the contours of different metaphysical worldviews or “conceptual schemes.” At the same time, and despite his naturalism and scientism which pitted him against speculative metaphysics, Quine’s holistic views about meaning and verification opened the door to speculative metaphysics by showing that theory cannot be reduced to observation even in the sciences. In the 1960s and 70s, the attempts of Donald Davidson and others to construct a formal theory of meaning based on Alfred Tarski’s formal definition of truth eventually led to the development of possible worlds semantics by David Lewis. Consistent with the Quinean insight that meaning is connected to holistic worldviews or, in more metaphysical terms, world-states, possible worlds semantics defines important logical concepts such as validity, soundness and completeness, as well as concepts that earlier logics were incapable of handling—such as possibility and necessity—in terms of total descriptions of a way that some worlds or all worlds might be/have been. For example, proposition p is necessary, if p is true in all possible worlds. Thus, despite its formalism, possible world semantics approximates some aspects of traditional metaphysics that earlier analytic philosophy eschewed.

With the advent of possible worlds semantics, attention shifted from the notion of meaning to that of reference. The latter has to do explicitly with the language-world connection, and so has an overtly metaphysical aspect. In the 1970s, direct reference theories came to dominate the philosophy of language. Developed independently by Saul Kripke and Ruth Barcan Marcus, a direct reference theory claims that some words—particularly proper names—have no meaning, but simply serve as “tags” (Marcus’ term) or “rigid designators” (Kripke’s term) for the things they name. Tagging or rigid designation is usually spelled-out in terms of possible worlds: it is a relation between name and thing such that it holds in all possible worlds. This then provides a linguistic analog of a metaphysical theory of identity the likes of which one finds in traditional “substance” metaphysics such as that of Aristotle. With the restrictions characteristic of earlier analytic philosophy removed, these positions in the philosophy of language made for an easy transition into metaphysics proper.

c. The Renaissance in History

Because analytic philosophy initially saw itself as superseding traditional philosophy, its tendency throughout much of the twentieth century was to disregard the history of philosophy. It is even reported that a sign reading “just say no to the history of ideas” once hung on a door in the Philosophy building at Princeton University (Grafton 2004, 2). Though earlier analytic philosophers would sometimes address the views of a philosopher from previous centuries, they frequently failed to combine philosophical acumen with historical care, thereby falling into faulty, anachronistic interpretations of earlier philosophers.

Beginning in the 1970s, some in the analytic context began to rebel against this anti-historical attitude. The following remembrance by Daniel Garber describes well the emerging historical consciousness in the analytic context (though this was not then and is not now so widespread as to count as characteristic of analytic philosophy itself):

What my generation of historians of philosophy was reacting against was a bundle of practices that characterized the writing of the history of philosophy in the period: the tendency to substitute rational reconstructions of a philosopher’s views for the views themselves; the tendency to focus on an extremely narrow group of figures (Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley and Hume in my period); within that very narrow canon the tendency to focus on just a few works at the exclusion of others, those that best fit with our current conception of the subject of philosophy; the tendency to work exclusively from translations and to ignore secondary work that was not originally written in English; the tendency to treat the philosophical positions as if they were those presented by contemporaries, and on and on and on. (Garber 2004, 2)

Over against this “bundle of practices,” the historical movement began to interpret the more well-known problems and views of historical figures in the context of, first, the wholes of their respective bodies of work, second, their respective intellectual contexts, noting how their work related to that of the preceding generation of thinkers, and, third, the broader social environment in which they lived and thought and wrote.

Eventually, this new historical approach was adopted by philosopher-scholars interested in the history of analytic philosophy itself. As a result, the last two decades have seen the emergence of the history (or historiography) of analytic philosophy as an increasingly important sub-discipline within analytic philosophy itself. Major figures in this field include Tom Baldwin, Hans Sluga, Nicholas Griffin, Peter Hacker, Ray Monk, Peter Hylton, Hans-Johann Glock and Michael Beaney, among a good many others. The surge of interest in the history of analytic philosophy has even drawn efforts from philosophers better known for work in “core” areas of analytic philosophy, such as Michael Dummett and Scott Soames.

Some of these authors are responsible for discovering or re-discovering the fact that neither Moore nor Russell conceived of themselves as linguistic philosophers. Others have been involved in the debate over Frege mentioned in Section 2c. All this has served to undermine received views and to open a debate concerning the true nature of analytic philosophy and the full scope of its history. (For more on this, see Preston 2004, 2005a-b).

6. References and Further Reading

The main divisions of this bibliography correspond to the main divisions of the article, which in turn correspond to the main historical phases of analytic philosophy. In addition, there is at the end a section on anthologies, collections and reference works that do not fit nicely under the other headings.

a. The Revolution of Moore and Russell: Cambridge Realism and The Linguistic Turn

Primary Sources

  • Moore, G. E. 1899: “The Nature of Judgment,” Mind 8, 176-93. Reprinted in Moore 1993, 1-19.
  • Moore, G. E. 1903a: Principia Ethica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Moore, G. E. 1903b: “The Refutation of Idealism” Mind 12, 433-53. Reprinted in Moore 1993, 23-44.
  • Moore, G. E. 1925: “A Defense of Common Sense” in J. H. Muirhead ed., Contemporary British Philosophy, London: Allen and Unwin, 193-223. Reprinted in Moore 1959, 126-148, and Moore 1993, 106-33.
  • Moore, G. E. 1939: “Proof of an External World,” Proceedings of the British Academy 25, 273-300. Reprinted in Moore 1993, 147-70.
  • Moore, G. E. 1942a: “An Autobiography,” in Schilpp ed., 1942, 3-39.
  • Moore, G. E. 1942b: “A Reply to My Critics,” in Schilpp ed., 1942, 535-677.
  • Moore, G. E. 1959: Philosophical Papers, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Moore, G. E. 1993: G.E. Moore: Selected Writings, ed. Thomas Baldwin, London: Routledge.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1959: My Philosophical Development, London: George Allen and Unwin; New York: Simon and Schuster.

Secondary Sources

  • Ayer, A.J. (ed ) 1971: Russell and Moore: The Analytical Heritage, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Baldwin, T. 1990: G. E. Moore, London: Routledge.
  • Baldwin, T. 1991: “The Identity Theory of Truth,” Mind, New Series, Vol. 100, No. 1, 35-52.
  • Bell, David. 1999: “The Revolution of Moore and Russell: A Very British Coup?” in Anthony O’Hear (ed.), German Philosophy Since Kant, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Griffin, Nicholas. 1991: Russell’s Idealist Apprenticeship, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hylton, Peter. 1990: Russell, Idealism, and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Schilpp, P.A., ed. 1942: The Philosophy of G.E. Moore, Library of Living Philosophers Vol. 4, La Salle: Open Court.

b. Russell and the Early Wittgenstein: Ideal Language and Logical Atomism

Primary Sources

  • Frege, Gottlob. 1879: Concept Script, a formal language of pure thought modeled upon that of arithmetic, tr. by S. Bauer-Mengelberg, in J. van Heijenoort (ed.), From Frege to Gödel: A Source Book in Mathematical Logic, 1879-1931, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1892: “On Sense and Reference” tr. by M. Black, in Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, P. Geach and M. Black (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell, 3rd ed., 1980.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1905: “On Denoting,” Mind 14: 479-93.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1908: “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” American Journal of Mathematics, 30, 222-262. Reprinted in Russell 1956, 59-102.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1914: “On Scientific Method in Philosophy,” in Russell 1918, 97-124.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1918-19: “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism,” The Monist 28:495-527 and 29:33-63, 190-222, 344-80; reprinted La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1985.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1918: Mysticism and Logic: and Other Essays, New York: Longmans, Green and Co.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1944a: “My Mental Development,” in Schilpp, ed. 1944, 3-20.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1944b: “Reply to Criticisms,” in Schilpp, ed. 1944, 681-741.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1946: “The Philosophy of Logical Analysis,” from A History of Western Philosophy, London: Allen and Unwin; New York: Simon and Schuster, 1946; reprinted in Dennon and Egner, eds., 1961, pp. 301-307.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1950: “Is Mathematics Purely Linguistic?,” in Russell 1973, pp. 295-306.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1956: Logic and Knowledge, Robert Marsh, ed., London: Unwin Hyman Ltd.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1959: My Philosophical Development, London: Unwin.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1973: Essays in Analysis, Douglas lackey, ed., London: George Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • Russell, Bertrand, and Whitehead, Alfred North. 1910-1913: Principia Mathematica 3 vols. London: Cambridge University Press. Second edition 1925.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1922: Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, tr. C.K. Ogden. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.

Secondary Sources

  • Kenny, Anthony. 2000: Frege: An Introduction to the Founder of Modern Analytic Philosophy, Blackwell Publishers.
  • Baker, G .P. and Hacker, P.M.S. 1983: “Dummett’s Frege or Through a Looking-Glass Darkly,” Mind, 92, pp. 239-246.
  • Baker, G .P. and Hacker, P.M.S. 1984: Frege: Logical Excavations, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Baker, G .P. and Hacker, P.M.S. 1987: “Dummett’s Dig: Looking-Glass Archaeology,” Philosophical Quarterly, 37, pp. 86-99.
  • Baker, G .P. and Hacker, P.M.S. 1989: “The Last Ditch,” Philosophical Quarterly, 39, pp. 471-477.
  • Dummett, Michael. 1991: Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, London: Duckworth.
  • Monk, Ray and Palmer, Anthony (eds.). 1996: Bertrand Russell and the Origins of Analytical Philosophy, Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
  • Reck, Erich (ed.). 2001: From Frege to Wittgenstein: Perspectives on Early analytic philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pears, D.F. 1967: Bertrand Russell and the British Tradition in Philosophy, London: Collins.
  • Schilpp, P.A. 1944: The Philosophy of Bertrand RussellLibrary of Living Philosophers Vol. 5, La Salle: Open Court.
  • Schrenmann, R. (ed.) 1967: Bertrand Russell: Philosopher of the Century, London: Allen and Unwin.
  • Tait, William (ed). 1997: Early Analytic Philosophy: Frege, Russell, Wittgenstein; Essays in Honor of Leonard Linsky, Chicago: Open Court.

c. Logical Positivism, the Vienna Circle, and Quine

Primary Sources

  • Ayer, A.J. 1936: Language, Truth and Logic, London: Gollantz; second edition 1946; reprinted New York: Dover, 1952.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1928: The Logical Structure of the World. English trans. published by Berkeley: University of California Press, 1969.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1934: “On the Character of Philosophical Problems,” tr. W.M. Malisoff, in Rorty (ed.) 1967, 54-62.
  • Hempel, Carl. 1950: “Problems and Changes in the Empiricist Criterion of Meaning.” Revue Internationale de Philosophie 4:41-63; reprinted in Ayer (ed.) 1959.
  • Quine, W. V. “Truth by Convention.” In O.H. Lee (ed.), Philosophical Essays for A.N. Whitehead, New York: Longmans, 1936; reprinted in Ways of Paradox: New York: Random House, 1966.
  • Quine, W. V. 1951: “Two Dogmas of Empiricism.” Philosophical Review 60(1951):20-43.
  • Quine, W. V. Word and Object. Cambridge MA: MIT Press, 1960.
  • Quine, W. V. Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press, 1969.

Secondary Sources

  • Ayer, A.J. (ed ) 1959: Logical Positivism, Westport: Greenwood Press, 1959.
  • Schilpp, P.A. 1963: The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, Library of Living Philosophers, Vol. 11, La Salle: Open Court.
  • Schilpp, P.A. The Philosophy of W.V. Quine, Library of Living Philosophers, Vol. 18, La Salle: Open Court.
  • Schilpp, P.A. 1992: The Philosophy of A. J. Ayer, Library of Living Philosophers, Vol. 21, La Salle: Open Court.
  • Sarkar, Sahotra (ed.) 1996: Science and Philosophy in the Twentieth Century: Basic Works of Logical Empiricism, 6 vols., New York & London: Garland Publishing.

d. The Later Wittgenstein, et al.: Ordinary-Language Philosophy

Primary Sources

  • Austin, J.L. 1962: How to Do Things with Words, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, J.L. 1962: Sense and Sensibilia, London: Oxford University Press.
  • Grice, Paul. 1989: Studies in the Way of Words, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1949: The Concept of Mind, New York: Barnes and Noble.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1953: Dilemmas, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Strawson, Peter. 1950: "On Referring" Mind, 59: 320-344.
  • Strawson, Peter and Grice, H. P. 1956: "In Defense of a Dogma,” Philosophical Review, 65: 141-58; reprinted in Grice 1989.
  • Wisdom, John. 1931: Interpretation and Analysis in Relation to Bentham’s Theory of Definition,London: Kegan, Paul, Trench, Trubner &Co.
  • Wisdom, John. 1952: Other Minds, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1953: Philosophical Investigations, tr. G.E.M. Anscombe. Oxford: Blackwell.

Secondary Sources

  • Canfield, J.V. (ed) 1986: The Philosophy of Wittgenstein, New York and London: Garland Publishing, Inc.
  • Hacker, P.M.S. 1986: Insight and Illusion: Themes in the Philosophy of Wittgenstein, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Kripke, Saul. 1982: Wittgenstein On Rules and Private Language, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Urmson, J. O. 1956: Philosophical Analysis: Its Development Between the Two World Wars, London, Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press.

e. The 1960s and After: The Era of Eclecticism

  • Hacking, Ian, 1975: Why Does Language Matter to Philosophy?, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kripke, Saul. 1980: Naming and Necessity Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Mundle, C. W. K. 1970: A Critique of Linguistic Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Gellner, E. 1959: Words and Things: A Critical Account of Linguistic Philosophy and a Study in Ideology, London: Gollancz.

f. Critical and Historical Accounts of Analytic Philosophy

  • Ayer, A. J., et al. 1963: The Revolution in Philosophy, London: Macmillan & Co. Ltd.
  • Ayer, A.J. (ed ) 1982: Philosophy in the Twentieth Century, London: Weidenfield and Nicolson.
  • Beaney, Michael. 2003: “Analysis,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, URL= <>.
  • Biletzki and Matar (eds.). 1998: The Story of Analytic Philosophy: Plot and Heroes, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Capaldi, Nicholas. 2000: The Enlightenment Project in the Analytic Conversation, Dordrecht, Boston, London: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Charlton, William. 1991: The Analytic Ambition: An Introduction to Philosophy, Oxford and Cambridge: Blackwell.
  • Clarke, D.S. 1997: Philosophy’s Second Revolution: Early and Recent Analytic Philosophy, La Salle: Open Court.
  • Coffa, J.A. 1991: The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cohen, L. J. 1986: The Dialogue of Reason: An Analysis of Analytical Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Collingwood, R.G. An Essay on Philosophical Method
  • Corrado, Michael. 1975: The Analytic Tradition in Philosophy: Background and Issues, Chicago: American Library Association.
  • Dummett, Michael. 1993: Origins of Analytical Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Garber, Daniel. 2004: “Philosophy and the Scientific Revolution,” in Teaching New Histories of Philosophy, Princeton: Princeton University Center for Human Values.
  • Glock, Hans-Johann (ed.). 1997: The Rise of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Grafton, Anthony. 2004: “A Note from Inside the Teapot,” in Teaching New Histories of Philosophy, Princeton: Princeton University Center for Human Values.
  • Hanna, Robert. 2001: Kant and the Foundations of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Mehta, Ved. 1961: Fly and the Fly Bottle: Encounters with British Intellectuals, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Nagel, Ernest. 1936a-b: “Impressions and Appraisals of Analytic Philosophy in Europe,” The Journal of Philosophy vol. 33, no. 1, 5-24 and no. 2, 29-53.
  • Pap, Arthur. 1949: Elements of Analytic Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Preston, Aaron. 2004: “Prolegomena to Any Future History of Analytic Philosophy,” Metaphilosophy, vol. 35, no. 4, 445-465.
  • Preston, Aaron. 2005a: “Conformism in Analytic Philosophy: On Shaping Philosophical Boundaries and Prejudices,” The Monist, Volume 88, Number 2, April 2005.
  • Preston, Aaron. 2005b: “Implications of Recent Work on Analytic Philosophy,” The Bertrand Russell Society Quarterly, no. 127 (August 2005), 11-30.
  • Prosch, Harry. 1964: The Genesis of Twentieth Century Philosophy: The Evolution of Thought from Copernicus to the Present, Garden City: Doubleday and Co., Inc.
  • Soames, Scott. 2003. Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century, 2 vols., Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Stroll, Avrum. 2000: Twentieth Century Analytic Philosophy, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Warnock, G.J. 1958: English Philosophy Since 1900, London: Oxford University Press.

g. Anthologies and General Introductions

  • Ammerman, Robert (ed.). 1990: Classics of Analytic Philosophy, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Baillie, James (ed.). 2002: Contemporary Analytic Philosophy: Core Readings, 2nd edition, Prentice Hall.
  • Martinich, A. P. and Sosa, David (eds.). 2001a: Analytic Philosophy: An Anthology, Blackwell Publishers.
  • Martinich, A. P. and Sosa, David (eds.). 2001b: A Companion to Analytic Philosophy, Blackwell Publishers.
  • Rorty, Richard (ed.). 1992: The Linguistic Turn: Essays in Philosophical Method, Chicago and London: The University of Chicago Press.

Author Information

Aaron Preston
Valparaiso University
U. S. A.

George Edward Moore (1873—1958)

moore-ge G. E. Moore was a highly influential British philosopher of the early twentieth century. His career was spent mainly at Cambridge University, where he taught alongside Bertrand Russell and, later, Ludwig Wittgenstein. The period of their overlap there has been called the “golden age” of Cambridge philosophy. Moore’s main contributions to philosophy were in the areas of metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and philosophical methodology. In epistemology, Moore is remembered as a stalwart defender of commonsense realism. Rejecting skepticism on the one hand, and, on the other, metaphysical theories that would invalidate the commonsense beliefs of “ordinary people” (non-philosophers), Moore articulated three different versions of a commonsense-realist epistemology over the course of his career.

Moore’s epistemological interests also motivated much of his metaphysical work, which to a large extent was focused on the ontology of cognition. In this regard, Moore was an important voice in the discussion about sense-data that dominated Anglo-American epistemology in the early twentieth century.

In ethics, Moore is famous for driving home the difference between moral and non-moral properties, which he cashed-out in terms of the non-natural and the natural. Moore’s classification of the moral as non-natural was to be one of the hinges upon which moral philosophy in the Anglo-American academy turned until roughly 1960.

Moore’s approach to philosophizing involved focusing on narrow problems and avoiding grand synthesis. His method was to scrutinize the meanings of the key terms in which philosophers expressed themselves while maintaining an implicit commitment to the ideals of clarity, rigor, and argumentation. This aspect of his philosophical style was sufficiently novel and conspicuous that many saw it as an innovation in philosophical methodology. In virtue of this, Moore, along with Bertrand Russell, is widely acknowledged as a founder of analytic philosophy, the kind of philosophy that has dominated the academy in Britain and the United States since roughly the 1930s.

Moore also had a significant influence outside of academic philosophy, through his contacts in the Cambridge Apostles and the Bloomsbury group. In both academic and non-academic spheres, Moore’s influence was due in no small part to his exceptional personality and moral character.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Metaphysics and Epistemology
    1. Internal Relations and Absolute Idealism
    2. The Identity Theory of Truth, Propositional Realism, and Direct Realism
    3. Sense-Data and Indirect Realism
    4. From the Ontology of Cognition to Criteriology
  3. Ethics
    1. Goodness and Intrinsic Value
    2. The Open Question Argument and the Naturalistic Fallacy
    3. Ideal Utilitarianism
    4. The Influence of Moore’s Ethical Theory
  4. Philosophical Methodology
  5. Moore’s Influence and Character
  6. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

George Edward Moore was born on November 4, 1873, one of seven children of Daniel and Henrietta Moore. There were eight Moore children in all, as Daniel had a daughter from his first wife. G. E. Moore was raised in the Upper Norwood district of South London. His early education came at the hands of his parents: his father taught him reading, writing, and music; and his mother taught him French. Moore was a more-than-competent pianist and composer. At eight he was enrolled at Dulwich College, where he studied mainly Greek and Latin, but also French, German, and mathematics. At eighteen he entered Cambridge University, where he began as a student in Classics.

His first two years of University study proved to be less than challenging, his time at Dulwich having already prepared him exceptionally well in Greek and Latin. It was during this time that Moore became interested in philosophy. As he later reminisced:

I had indeed at Dulwich read Plato’s Protagoras …; but I was certainly not then very keenly excited by any of the philosophical questions which that dialogue raises …. What must have happened, during this second year at Cambridge, was that I found I was very keenly interested in certain philosophical statements which I heard made in conversation. (Moore 1942a, 13)

The conversations in question involved such notables as Henry Sidgwick, James Ward, and J.M.E. McTaggart, who became his teachers, and Bertrand Russell—then a student two years ahead of Moore—who for a time became his friend and philosophical ally. Moore’s and Russell’s relationship was lifelong, but it became strained early on. It was Russell who convinced Moore to study Moral Science, a division of philosophy in the British University system. In 1896, Moore took first-class honors in both Classics and Moral Science. After this, he attempted to win a Prize-Fellowship, as McTaggart and Russell had done before him. He succeeded in 1898, on his second attempt, and remained at Cambridge as a Fellow of Trinity College until 1904.

Beginning around 1897, and continuing through his time as a Fellow, Moore began to act as a “professional” philosopher, participating in the doings of the extant philosophical societies (such as the Aristotelian Society and the Moral Sciences Club) and publishing his work. Many of his best known and most influential works date from this period. It was also during this period that Moore instigated the momentous break from the then dominant philosophy of Absolute Idealism that would prove to be the first step toward the rise of analytic philosophy.

After his fellowship ended, Moore left Cambridge for a period of seven years, during which time he lived in Edinburgh and Richmond, Surrey, and worked independently on various philosophical projects. He returned to Cambridge in 1911 as a lecturer in Moral Science, and he remained there for the majority of his career, and, indeed, his life. He earned a Litt.D. in 1913, was elected a fellow of the British Academy in1918, and was chosen as James Ward's successor as Professor of Mental Philosophy and Logic in 1925. He occupied that position until 1939, when he retired and was succeeded by Wittgenstein. From 1940 to1944 Moore was a visiting professor at several universities in the United States. He then returned to Cambridge, but not to teaching. He served as editor of Mind, the leading philosophical journal of the day, from 1921 to 1947. In 1951, he was awarded the British Order of Merit.

Beyond his professional career, Moore had a successful family life. In 1916 at age 43, he married Dorothy Ely, who had been his student. The couple had two sons: Nicholas (b.1918) and Timothy (b. 1922). By all accounts, Moore was an exemplary husband and father.

Moore died in Cambridge on October 24, 1958. He is buried in St. Giles’ churchyard.

2. Metaphysics and Epistemology

Two facts make it difficult to separate Moore’s contributions to metaphysics from his contributions to epistemology. First, his main contributions to metaphysics were in the ontology of cognition, which is often treated as a branch of epistemology. Second, his main contributions to epistemology were motivated by what he called the “commonsense” or “ordinary” view of the world, and this is properly a metaphysical conception, a worldview or Weltanschauung. Consequently, the next section treats Moore’s metaphysics and his epistemology together.

a. Internal Relations and Absolute Idealism

Moore became interested in philosophy at a time when Absolute Idealism had dominated the British universities for half a century, in a tradition stretching from S.T. Coleridge and T.H. Green to F.H. Bradley and J.M.E. McTaggart. McTaggart was Moore’s earliest philosophical mentor. Moore’s earliest philosophical views were inherited directly from him.

Absolute Idealism is a brand of metaphysical monism. It implies that, although the world presents itself to us as a collection of more or less discrete objects (this bird, that table, the earth and the sun, etc.), it really is one indivisible whole, whose nature is mental (or spiritual, or ideal) rather than material. Thus it is also a form of anti-realism, since it claims that the world of ordinary experience is something of an illusion—not that the objects of ordinary experience do not exist, but that they are not, as we normally take them to be, discrete. Instead, every object exists and is what it is at least partly in virtue of the relations it bears to other things—more precisely, to all other things. This is called the doctrine of internal relations, which Moore understood as the view that all relations are necessary. On this view, my coffee cup is not just the apparently self-contained entity that I lift off the table and draw to my lips. Instead, it contains, as essential parts of itself, relations to every other existing thing; thus, as I draw it to my lips, I draw the universe along with it, and am responsible for, in a sense, reconfiguring the universe. Since, on this view, everything that exists does so only in virtue of its relations to everything else, it is misleading to say of any one thing, for example, my coffee cup, that it exists simpliciter. The only thing that exists simpliciter is the whole—the entire network of necessarily related objects.

Though Moore accepted Absolute Idealism for a short while in his undergraduate years, he is best remembered for the views he developed in opposition to it. In fact, what is most characteristic of Moore’s mature philosophy is a thoroughgoing realism about what he came to call the “commonsense” or “ordinary” view of the world. This involves a lush metaphysical pluralism (the belief that there are many things that exist simpliciter) that stands in sharp contrast to the monism of the Absolute Idealists.

Inklings of Moore’s misgivings about Absolute Idealism begin to appear as early as 1897, in his first (unsuccessful) Prize-Fellowship dissertation on “The Metaphysical Basis of Ethics.” Though in it he openly identifies with the British Idealist school, it is here that Moore first raises a point that proved to be the hole in the Idealists’ dike. The Idealists’ doctrine of the internality of all relations has implications for the ontology of cognition. Specifically, it implies that objects of knowledge/cognition are not independent of their knowers. In other words, being known (cognized, perceived, etc.) makes a difference to the nature and being of the thing being known, the “object” of knowledge. Indeed, it was this aspect of the view which marked it as Idealist, as the Idealists commonly posited a great Mind, often simply called “the Absolute,” that “grounded” the whole of reality by cognizing it. And it is this view in the ontology of cognition that Moore obliquely rejects in his 1897 dissertation. He does not address it directly and in specie, but only in the restricted context of moral epistemology. In discussing Kant’s moral epistemology, Moore argues that Kant’s conception of practical reason conflates the faculty of judgment with judgments themselves (that is, bearers of objective truth), which he thinks should be kept separate. To maintain a sharp distinction between cognitive faculties and their activities, on the one hand, and their objects, on the other, is a staple of Austro-German philosophy from Bolzano and Lotze to Husserl, and it is likely that Moore got the idea from reading in that tradition (cf. Bell 1999).

At this point, Moore had neither the doctrine of internal relations nor British Idealism in his sights. It is probably more accurate to say that he was objecting to what is frequently called psychologism—the view that apparently objective truths (for example, of logic, mathematics, ethics, etc.) are to be accounted for in terms of the operations of subjective cognitive or “psychological” faculties. Psychologism was common to nearly all versions of Kantian and post-Kantian Idealism, including British Absolute Idealism. It was also a common feature of thought in the British empirical tradition, from Hume to Mill. For the British Idealists, psychologism was a consequence of the doctrine of internal relations as the latter applies to the ontology of cognition.

It was not long before Moore recognized this. Accordingly, he expanded the scope of his 1897 criticism from the ontology of moral knowledge to the ontology of knowledge in general, and this quickly became the principal weapon in his rebellion against British Idealism. This began in earnest in his successful 1898 Prize-Fellowship dissertation, which formed the basis for his first influential paper, “The Nature of Judgment” (Moore 1899). In both of these works, Moore pushes the anti-psychologistic distinction between subjective faculties/activities and their objects. He couples this, however, with a peculiar account of the nature of truth, of propositions and of ordinary objects.

b. The Identity Theory of Truth, Propositional Realism, and Direct Realism

The Idealist F.H. Bradley had held that truth was a matter of correspondence between a judgment (which was made up of ideas) and its object. At first glance Bradley’s view appears to be the classical correspondence theory of truth, but it is actually a peculiar inversion of that theory. On the classical correspondence theory, the “truth maker” is the object, not any subject who does the believing of this truth. That is, facts makes truths be true; believers don’t do this. But, given the Idealists’ views about the ontological priority of the mental/ideal and the internality of all relations, it follows that any judgment’s being true is ultimately due to the great Mind, the Absolute. Thus, as Moore notes at the beginning of his paper, while Bradley affirms that truth is not a relation between reality and our judgments, but rather judgments “in themselves,” he does not remain true to this view, and ends up flirting with psychologism.

Replacing Bradley’s overtly psychologistic terms “idea” and “judgment” with the more neutral terms “concept” and “proposition,” and maintaining his anti-psychologistic distinction between subject and object, Moore rejects the Idealistic inversion of the correspondence theory of truth. He does not simply revert to the classical version, however. Instead, he seeks to secure the objectivity of truth by eliminating the notion of correspondence entirely. Truth could not be a matter of correspondence between proposition and object, Moore argues, since in a case like “2+2=4” we regard the proposition as true even though there is no object in the empirical world to which the proposition corresponds. Thus, propositions must be regarded as true (or false) “in themselves,” without reference either to a subject which entertains them as elements in occurrent acts of consciousness, or to any object beyond them which they might be “about.” Instead, when a proposition is true, it is because a peculiar relation obtains among the concepts that make it up. Since this view casts the proposition as its own truth-maker, it has been called the “identity theory” of truth, (cf. Baldwin 1991). Moore sums up his view this way:

A proposition is composed not of words, nor yet of thoughts, but of concepts. Concepts are possible objects of thought; but this is no definition of them. … It is indifferent to their nature whether anybody thinks them or not. They are incapable of change, and the relation into which they enter with the knowing subject implies no action or reaction [on the part of the proposition]. … A proposition is a synthesis of concepts; and just as concepts are themselves immutably what they are, so they stand in infinite relations to one another equally immutable. A proposition is constituted by any number of concepts, together with a specific relation between them; and according to the nature of this relation the proposition may be either true or false. What kind of relation makes a proposition true, what false, cannot be further defined, but must be immediately recognised. (Moore 1899, 179-180)

Thus understood, propositions seem to be a lot like Platonic Forms: they are unchanging bearers of truth that exist independently of any “instances” of consciousness. Historically, there is nothing peculiar in this (apart from its appearance in the British context, perhaps). In fact, these views of Moore’s are in keeping with what may be called the “standard” nineteenth and early-twentieth century view of propositions held by Bolzano, Frege, Russell, W.E. Johnson, and L.S. Stebbing (cf. Willard 1984, 180 f.; Bell 1999).

What is novel in Moore, however, is his identity theory of truth, and his related identification of ordinary objects with propositions. One aspect of the standard view was that whenever a proposition happened to be involved in an occurrent act of consciousness, it played the role of “object”—the act was immediately of or about the proposition. Thus, prima facie, the only form of epistemological realism compatible with the standard view is “indirect” or “representative” realism. This is the view that the external world is not given to us directly, but only as mediated by a surrogate object, like a proposition or, in Moore’s later philosophy, a sense-datum. But this aspect of the standard view chaffed against Moore’s growing partiality for common-sense (or “naïve”) realism, which assumes direct realism in epistemology. Thus, in order to secure direct, cognitive access to the external world, Moore cleverly eliminated the would-be mediators by identifying propositions with the objects of ordinary experience themselves.

His first move in this direction was to show that the identity theory of truth applies to propositions that, unlike “2+2=4,” do seem to require a relation to something outside themselves in order to be true. For instance, it is hard to see how the sentence “The cat is on the mat” could be true in itself, apart from a relation to some state of affairs in the empirical world. However, Moore says:

… this description [of truth] will also apply to those cases where there appears to be a reference to existence. Existence is itself a concept; it is something which we mean; and the great body of propositions, in which existence is joined to other concepts or syntheses of concepts are simply true or false according to the relation in which it stands to them. (Moore 1899, 181)

So, “The cat is on the mat” is true when the concepts constitutive of it (“cat,” “mat,” “on,” and so forth) are united with the concept “existence” by that indefinable, internal relation that is truth. Thus also for “The cat exists.” It is not that the proposition is true only if the cat exists; rather, it is that the cat exists only if the proposition is true in virtue of its own internal structure.

By making existence both dependent on truth and, like truth, internal to a proposition, Moore is in effect identifying the class of existents with the class of true propositions that involve the concept “existence” as a constituent. As Moore goes on to say “an existent is seen to be nothing but a concept or complex of concepts standing in a unique relation to the concept of existence,” and thus “it now appears that perception is to be regarded philosophically as the cognition of an existential proposition” (Moore 1899, 182-3). In this way, “the opposition of concepts to existents disappears,” (Moore 1899, 183), and Moore secures a direct realist account of cognition.

By the same token, he commits himself to what is, on the face of it, an unlikely view of the world: given the identity theory of truth, “it seems necessary to regard the world as formed of concepts” (Moore 1899, 182). But, Moore reminds us, this is not to be taken as a claim that reality is at bottom mentalistic or Ideal; for his account of concepts and propositions has already made clear that these exist independently of any acts of thinking. Thus, he says:

…the description of an existent as a proposition … seems to lose its strangeness, when it is remembered that a proposition is here to be understood, not as anything subjective—as an assertion or affirmation of something—but as the combination of concepts which is affirmed. (Moore 1899, 183)

Whether this really does alleviate the description’s strangeness is contestable; but it is clear that Moore means for it to be consistent with our commonsense view of the world. Unfortunately, however, the view has a peculiar consequence that is anything but commonsensical. Bertrand Russell called it the problem of “objective falsehoods.” Given Moore’s theory of truth and its attendant realism about propositions, false propositions have, or may have, the same ontological status as true propositions. At the very least, they are somehow “there” to be asserted or affirmed just as true propositions are. Moreover, since truth and falsity are prior to and independent of existence, there is no obvious reason why a false proposition could not include “existence” as a concept just as a true one can. By 1910, Bertrand Russell—who at first accepted Moore’s views—had convinced both himself and Moore that they were to be rejected precisely for these reasons (see Russell 1906, 1910; Moore 1953; see also the discussion of these matters in Baldwin 1991).

Nonetheless, Moore had held this view of truth and reality for approximately a decade, during which time many of his most influential works were published. Among these was his celebrated paper “The Refutation of Idealism” (Moore 1903b). Here he tackles Idealism head-on and in specie. Asserting that all forms of Idealism rest on the claim that esse is percipi (“to be is to be perceived,” or, as Moore treats it, “to be is to be experienced”), Moore argues that the claim is false. He begins by analyzing in great detail several possible meanings of the formula “esse is percipi.” Ultimately, he determines that Idealists take it to be an analytic truth, in that it is proved by the law of contradiction. Thus, they also believe existence and cognition to be somehow identical. According to this, for yellow to exist just is for someone to have a sensation of yellow. In identifying yellow and the sensation of yellow, the Idealist “fails to see that there is anything whatever in the latter that is not in the former” and thus, for him, “yellow and the sensation of yellow are absolutely identical” (Moore 1903b, 442). But, according to Moore, this is a mistake. Careful attention to the sensation of yellow, on the one hand, and yellow, on the other, will reveal that they are not identical. As he says, “the Idealist maintains that object and subject are necessarily connected, mainly because he fails to see that they are distinct” (Moore 1903b, 442); but Moore thinks he can show that they are distinct, and he deploys two arguments to this end.

His first argument turns upon what would later come to be called the paradox of analysis—an intractable problem that, ironically, would plague Moore’s own later work. The paradox can be explained in terms of the familiar act of defining a term. In any case of definition, one is confronted with two bits of language: the term to be defined (the definiendum) and the term that does the defining, the definition itself (the definiens). Both definiendum and definiens are supposed to have the same meaning—else the latter would not be able to illuminate the meaning of the former. But if both terms mean the same, it is hard to see how giving a definition could be illuminating. Consider the case of the definiendum “bachelor” and its definiens “unmarried man.” In order for “unmarried man” to be a good definition of “bachelor,” it must mean the same as “bachelor.” But if it means exactly the same thing, then it seems that saying “‘bachelor’ means ‘unmarried man’” shouldn’t be any different from saying “‘bachelor’ means ‘bachelor’” or “‘unmarried man’ means ‘unmarried man.’” And yet there does seem to be a difference in that we find the one informative; but the others, not. Thus it seems that there is a difference in meaning between “bachelor” and “unmarried man.”

In sum, then, the paradox is this: a term and its definition must say the same thing in order for the definition to be correct, and yet they must say something different in order for the definition to be informative. The paradox can be put into the form of a dilemma:

  1. If a definiens is correct, then its meaning is the same as that of the definiendum.
  2. If a definiens is informative, then its meaning is not the same as that of the definiendum.
  3. A defniens’ meaning cannot be both the same and not the same as that of the definiendum.
  4. Thus, a definiens cannot be both correct and informative.

Now, this paradox functions in Moore’s first argument against the formula “Esse is percipi” in the following way. The formula itself can be read as a definition. Just as we say, “A bachelor is an unmarried man,” so the Idealist says, “To exist is to be cognized,” or “Yellow is the sensation of yellow.” However, if the two really were identical, it would be superfluous to assert that that they were; thus, the fact that the Idealist sees some need to assert the formula reveals that there is, as with any definiendum and its definiens, some difference between existence and cognition, or yellow and the sensation of yellow. As Moore says,

Of course, the proposition [that is, the formula] also implies that experience is, after all, something distinct from yellow—else there would be no reason to insist that yellow is a sensation: and that the argument [that is, the formula] both affirms and denies that yellow and the sensation of yellow are distinct is what sufficiently refutes it. (Moore 1903b, 442)

The argument may seem decisive. However, we should note that it turns upon Moore’s decision to push the Idealists toward the second horn of the “paradox of analysis” dilemma. Both horns are utterly destructive to “knowledge by description” (of which definitional knowledge is a type), so the Idealists would fare no better with the first horn. But the paradox of analysis is a problem not only for the Idealists, but for everyone who wants to affirm the practice of giving a definition, or, as Moore would later call it, an “analysis” of a concept. Thus, one might be inclined to hold off on embracing either horn, and instead concentrate on resolving the paradox. Charity requires that we extend this reprieve to our adversaries as well. Indeed, except for the fact that Moore hadn’t yet fully grasped the scope of the paradox lying just below the surface of his argument, we’d have to say that he was being terribly unfair by insisting that the Idealists hurry up and impale themselves on the second horn.

Moore’s second argument is much better. It is essentially an application of the now familiar, anti-psychologistic distinction between subject and object. He begins by comparing a sensation of blue with a sensation of green. These are the same in one respect, in virtue of which they are both called “sensations”; but they differ in another respect, in virtue of which the one is said to be “of blue” and the other “of green.” Moore gives the name “consciousness” to the respect in which they are the same, and the respects in which they are different he calls “objects” of sensation or of consciousness. Thus, he says, every sensation is a complex of consciousness and object.

Having distinguished consciousness from object, Moore goes on to distinguish object from sensation. Focusing now on a single sensation, the sensation of blue, Moore says that, when it exists, either (1) consciousness alone exists, (2) the object alone (that is, blue) exists, or (3) both exist together (presumably this is the sensation of blue). But each of these possibilities represents a different state of affairs: neither (1) consciousness alone, nor (3) consciousness and blue together are identical to (2) blue. Thus it is not the case that the sensation of blue is identical to blue, and it is therefore false that esse is percipi.

This negative conclusion of Moore’s essay is the refutation of idealism, properly speaking. However, the essay also has a positive conclusion, which purports to establish the truth of a direct realist account of cognition. Most philosophers in the modern period have accepted some form of representationalism, according to which we have direct cognitive access only to our own mental states (ideas, impressions, perceptions, judgments, etc.). But, according to Moore, what his analysis of consciousness shows is that, “whenever I have a mere sensation or idea, the fact is that I am then aware of something which is … not an inseparable aspect of my experience;” and this has the monumental consequence that,

there is … no question of how we are to ‘get outside the circle of our own ideas and sensations.’ Merely to have a sensation is already to be outside that circle. It is to know something which is as truly and really not a part of my experience, as anything which I can ever know. (Moore 1903b, 450)

Consistent with his 1899 view, we have direct cognitive access to the objects of our experience.

c. Sense-Data and Indirect Realism

The direct realism of Moore’s early period depended heavily upon an ontology of cognition that included both his propositional realism and his identity theory of truth. When the problem of objective falsehoods finally drove him to abandon both, a revised account of cognition was required to secure some form of epistemological realism. For instance, no longer could he explain the difference between “2+2=4” and “The cat is on the mat” by referring to the presence of the concept “existence” in the latter proposition. Instead, Moore now cashed out the difference in terms of what he called “sense-data.”

Examples of include color patches (the octagonal patch of red associated with a stop sign) and appearances (the elliptical appearance of a coin when viewed at an angle). Beyond examples of this sort, exactly what sense-data are was never made sufficiently clear by Moore or others. Thanks largely to Moore, their nature was kept a matter of ongoing debate in the early twentieth century.

Most proponents of sense-data construed them as mental entities responsible for mediating our sensory experiences of external objects. For example, in perceiving a stop-sign, what one is immediately conscious of is some set of sense-data through which are conveyed the stop-sign’s size, shape, color, and so on. The stop-sign itself remains “outside the circle of ideas,” or rather, sense-data, and we are thus aware of it only indirectly. In its usual form, sense-data theory is a form of representationalism consistent with indirect realism, not direct realism.

Moore initially accepted this representationalist view of sense-data; but he was not long content with it, since it seemed to leave the commonsense view of the world open to skeptical doubts of a familiar, Cartesian variety. Consequently, he modified sense-data theory to make it a form of direct realism, just as he had previously done with proposition theory. His strategy in both cases was the same: by making the purported mental-mediators identical with external objects, he would eliminate the need for a mediator and make external objects directly available to consciousness. Thus, for a period of about fifteen years, Moore attempted off-and-on to defend a view according to which sense-data were identical to external objects or parts of such objects. For instance, a sense-datum could be identical to the whole of an object in the case of a sound, while for visible objects, which always have “hidden” sides (the underside of a table or the back side of a coin, for example) a single sense-datum could be identical to only a part of the object’s surface.

Ultimately, Moore could not sustain this sense-data version of direct realism any better than his previous, propositional version. It gave way under the weight of arguments such as the argument from illusion and the argument from synthetic incompatibility. The latter runs as follows. Suppose that person A is looking at the front side of a coin straight-on, and person B is looking at the same coin from an angle. To A, the front side of the coin appears to be circular; to B, it appears to be elliptical. The sense-data theorist accounts for this by saying that A is seeing a circular sense-datum, while B is seeing an elliptical sense-datum. But, given that A and B are looking at the same part of the coin’s surface (the whole surface of the front side), Moore’s proposal that sense-data are identical to parts of the surfaces of external objects entails that the whole surface of the front side of the coin is both circular and elliptical at the same time; but this implies a contradiction, and so cannot be true.

The argument from illusion raises problems analogous to the problem of “objective falsehoods,” which drove Moore from his early propositional realism. On the representationalist version of sense-data theory, we can explain the difference between true perceptions and false (illusory) perceptions by referring to the correspondence and lack of correspondence between a sense-datum and the external object it represents. On Moore’s direct realist version, however, it makes no sense to speak of a sense-datum as failing to correspond to the object. Since sense-data are identical to objects or their parts, there can be no sense-data without there being—or, rather their being—an object, and this implies both that illusion is impossible (which flies in the face of experience) and that all those experiences that we would normally call “illusory” really aren’t—the “illusory object” really exists if illusory sense-data exist.

By 1925, Moore conceded that he could find no way around these sorts of arguments (cf. Moore 1925), hence he fell back on a version of indirect realism.

d. From the Ontology of Cognition to Criteriology

With his failed attempt to sustain a direct realist version of sense-data theory, Moore had come to the end of his rope in trying to work out an adequate, realist ontology of cognition. This did not lead to his abandoning either epistemological or metaphysical realism in general, however. To do so would have been a genuine possibility, since to abandon direct realism is to admit that we have no direct evidence of the existence of the commonsense world. While “indirect” or “representational” versions of realism are possible, it is nonetheless natural to see representationalism as opening the door to the very sort of anti-realism (in forms like idealism, phenomenalism, and so on) that Moore had labored to overthrow.

Instead of sliding down the potentially slippery slope from representationalism to anti-realism, however, Moore dug in his heels, insisting that we are justified in accepting the commonsense view of the world despite the fact that we cannot adequately explain, ontologically, how the world is given to us. As Moore himself put it, “We are all, I think, in the strange position that we do know many things…and yet we do not know how we know them.” (Moore 1925; in 1959, 44).

This approach comes through clearly in Moore’s 1925 paper “A Defense of Common Sense.” Here, Moore acknowledges that direct realism, indirect realism, and phenomenalism are more or less equally matched contenders for the correct account of cognition. Since we cannot determine the correct account, we do not know how it is that we know. However, he argues, it would be wrong to see this as grounds for calling into question that we know or what we know. Indeed, there are many things that we know perfectly well, despite our inability to say how we know them. Among these “beliefs of common sense” are such propositions as “There exists at present a living human body, which is my body,” “Ever since it [this body] was born, it has been either in contact with or not far from the surface of the earth,” and “I have often perceived both body and other things which formed part of its environment, including other human bodies” (Moore 1925; in 1959, 33).

Moore claims that he knows these and many other propositions to be certainly and wholly true; and one of the other propositions that Moore claims to know with certainty is that others have also known the aforementioned propositions to be true of themselves, just as he knows them to be true of himself. By claiming that these propositions of common sense (hereafter CS propositions) are certainly true, Moore means to oppose the skeptic who would deny that we know anything with certainty. By claiming that CS propositions are wholly true, he means to oppose the Idealist, who would claim that no statement about some isolated object can be true simpliciter, since each object has its identity only as a part of the whole universe.

In support of his view, Moore claims that each CS proposition has an “ordinary meaning” which specifies exactly what it is one knows when one knows it. This “ordinary meaning” is perfectly clear to most everyone, except for some philosophers who

seem to think that [for example] the question “Do you believe that the earth has existed for many years past?” is not a plain question, such as should be met either by a plain “Yes” or “No,” or by a plain “I can’t make up my mind,” but is the sort of question which can be properly met by: “It all depends on what you mean by ‘the earth’ and ‘exists’ and ‘years’….” (Moore 1925; in 1959, 36)

But Moore thinks that to call things into question this way is perverse; and, far from being the task of philosophy, it actually undermines that task. For even the skeptic tacitly assents to the truth of CS propositions, at least in referring to himself as a philosopher, by making references to other philosophers with whom he may disagree, and so on:

For when I speak of ‘philosophers’ I mean, of course (as we all do), exclusively philosophers who have been human beings, with human bodies that have lived upon the earth, and who have at different times had many different experiences. (Moore 1925; in 1959, 40)

On the face of it, Moore’s general idea seems to be that the truth of CS propositions, and hence of the commonsense view of the world, is built into the terms of our ordinary language, so that if some philosopher wants to say that some CS proposition is false, he thereby disqualifies the very medium in which he expresses himself, and so speaks nonsensically. Either that or he is using terms in something other than their ordinary senses, in which case his claims have no bearing on the commonsense view of the world.

Since the bounds of intelligibility seem to be fixed by the ordinary meanings of CS propositions, the job of the philosopher begins by accepting them as starting points for philosophical reflection. Then, the philosopher questions not their truth, but what Moore calls their correct analysis. Giving an analysis resembles giving a definition, and in fact it is very difficult to say what distinguishes the two. For Moore, the difference is ontological: definition is performed upon words, analysis upon propositions and concepts. But both involve setting forth two terms that are supposed to mean the same, one of which is supposed to elucidate the other. In definition these are the definiendum (the term being defined) and the definiens (the term doing the defining); in analysis, they are the analysandum (the term being analyzed) and the analysans (the term doing the analyzing). Both may take the same verbal form, for example, “A brother is a male sibling” or “‘Brother’ means ‘male sibling’.” These sentences could express either an analysis or a definition, depending upon the intentions of the speaker. The difference cannot be determined just be looking. This was a matter of great confusion for Moore’s contemporaries. In any case, it is as analyses of CS propositions that views like direct realism, indirect realism, sense-data theory, phenomenalism, and the like have their place in philosophy. These views should not, according to Moore, disqualify or in any way challenge the commonsense view of the world, but only give us a deeper understanding of what it is to have a sensory experience, or to think a thought, etc.

Moore’s new approach to defending common sense is also apparent in what is arguably his most famous paper, “Proof of an External World” (Moore 1939). Here, after expending considerable effort to nail down the meaning of “external object” as “something whose existence does not depend on our experience,” Moore claims that he can prove some such objects exist

By holding up my two hands, and saying, as I make a certain gesture with the right hand, ‘Here is one hand’, and adding, as I make a certain gesture with the left, ‘and here is another’. (Moore 1939; in 1993, 166)

Moore’s complete line of thought seems to be this: “Here is one hand” is a CS proposition with an ordinary meaning. Using it in accordance with that meaning, presenting the hand for inspection is sufficient proof that the proposition is true—that there is indeed a hand there. Ditto for the other hand. But a hand, according to the ordinary meaning of “hand,” is a material object; and a material object, according to the ordinary meaning of “material object,” is an external object. Because there are two hands, and because hands are external objects, it follows that there is an external world, according to the ordinary meaning of “external world.”

Neither Moore’s defense of common sense nor his proof of an external world were universally convincing. Some misunderstood the latter as an attempt to disprove skepticism. Taken this way, it is clearly a miserable failure. However, as Moore himself later insisted, he never meant to disprove skepticism, but only to prove the existence of the external world:

I have sometimes distinguished between two different propositions, each of which has been made by some philosophers, namely (1) the proposition ‘There are no material things’ and (2) the proposition ‘Nobody knows for certain that there are any material things.’ And in my latest British Academy lecture called ‘Proof of an External World’ … I implied with regard to the first of these propositions that it could be proved to be false in such a way as this; namely, by holding up one of your hands and saying ‘This hand is a material thing; therefore there is at least one material thing’. But with regard to the second of the two propositions …. I do not think I have ever implied that it could be proved to be false in any such simple way … (Moore 1942b, 668)

Even without this misunderstanding, however, Moore’s new approach to promoting common sense is open to the charge of begging the question by simply assuming that CS propositions are true according to their ordinary meanings. Wittgenstein put the point bluntly: “Moore’s mistake lies in this—countering the assertion that one cannot know that, by saying ‘I do know it’” (Wittgenstein 1969, § 521). By stonewalling the skeptic in this way, Moore was in effect refusing to recognize that, lacking a plausible, direct realist account of cognition, there are legitimate grounds for questioning the truth of CS propositions. If it is possible that direct realism is false, then it is possible that none of our experiences connect us with the commonsense world. Thus, we have no indubitable evidence for there being such a world, and, supposing there are such things as CS propositions and their ordinary meanings, it is possible that they fail to represent reality accurately. Thus, both Moore’s defense and his proof are ill-founded, and can be maintained only by begging the question. Or so the objection goes.

Some have attempted to defend Moore, or at least Moorean style rejoinders to skepticism, by taking seriously Moore’s claim that he was not trying to disprove skepticism, and his admission that this would be a very hard thing to do. If we put aside the issue of proof, we can interpret Moore’s new approach as first, making a clean division between the ontology of cognition and what has come to be recognized as the other main aspect of epistemology—criteriology; and, second, attempting to deal with skepticism solely in terms of the latter. Whereas the ontology of cognition deals with the problem of how we know, criteriology deals with the problem of what we know, in the sense of what we are justified in believing. On this view, then, the issue is not whether commonsense realism is certainly true and skepticism certainly false; rather, the issue is what we ought to believe or regard as true given that we can neither prove nor disprove either position. On this interpretation, central to the Moorean approach is what has come to be called “the G. E. Moore shift” (a term coined by William Rowe). Consider a standard sort of skeptical argument:

  1. If I cannot tell the difference between waking and dreaming, then I cannot be sure that I have a body.
  2. I cannot tell the difference between waking and dreaming.
  3. Therefore, I cannot be sure that I have a body

Employing the G. E. Moore shift, we rearrange the propositions of the skeptic’s argument, thus:

  1. If I cannot tell the difference between waking and dreaming, then I cannot be sure that I have a body.
  2. I am sure that I have a body.
  3. Therefore, I can tell the difference between waking and dreaming.

The strategy can be generalized as follows, where CS is any proposition of common sense (such as “I am sure that I have a body”), and S is any skeptical proposition (such as “I cannot tell the difference between waking and dreaming”):

The Skeptic’s Argument

  1. If S then not-CS
  2. S
  3. not-CS

Moore’s Response (using “the shift”)

  1. If S then not-CS
  2. CS
  3. not-S

Both arguments are valid, but only one can be sound. Since both accept the conditional (1), the question of soundness comes down to the question of whether S or CS is true. And here Moore and the skeptic would be at an impasse, except that (according to Moore) we have more reason to believe any proposition of common sense than any skeptical proposition. That is because every skeptical proposition worth its salt is going to rest on some speculative account of the ontology of cognition that puts a mental surrogate (such as a proposition or a sense-datum) in place of what we would normally say was the object of our experience. But, given the highly uncertain nature of theories in the ontology of cognition, we are wise to treat them and claims based on them (as all legitimate skeptical claims are) with suspicion, and to refuse to let them bear too much weight in our decisions about what to believe. Thus, we should always end up on the side of commonsense.

In fact, this seems to be Moore’s procedure in a late paper called “Four Forms of Scepticism.” Taking as his S the claim made by Bertrand Russell that “I do not know for certain that this is a pencil,” Moore claims that it rests upon several assumptions, one of which is the denial of direct realism. And even though he admits to agreeing with Russell that direct realism is likely false, Moore nonetheless advocates rejecting S:

of no one of these [presuppositions of S] …do I feel as certain as that I do know for certain that this is a pencil. Nay, more: I do not think it is rational to be as certain of any one of these…propositions, as of the proposition that I do know that this is a pencil. (Moore 1959, 226)

It is clear that Moore is using the “shift” strategy. What is not clear is just what the source of justification for CS is supposed to be. In this case, at least, the shift seems to involve an appeal to a criterion of justification—and of rationality—that is not affected by the fact that we lack an adequate account of cognition. But Moore never tells us exactly what this criterion is. Since Moore, it has been the norm to attempt to do criteriology apart from the ontology of cognition, and the question about the criterion (or criteria) for justification remains a central matter of debate.

3. Ethics

Moore’s ethical views are presented in two books and two papers: Principia Ethica, Ethics, “The Conception of Intrinsic Value,” and “Is Goodness a Quality?” (respectively: Moore 1903a, 1912, 1922b, and 1932). Despite being vastly outnumbered by his writings on epistemology and metaphysics, his work in ethics was just as influential. The discrepancy in volume is due mainly to the fact that the details of Moore’s ethical views were far more stable, undergoing far less revision and development, than those of his metaphysical and epistemological views.

a. Goodness and Intrinsic Value

Moore’s most important ethical work is Principia Ethica. It had a profound impact in both philosophy and culture almost immediately upon its publication. In it, Moore lays out a version of ethical realism consistent with his early propositional realism and its attendant doctrines. In accordance with his “identity theory” of truth, ethical propositions, just like non-ethical propositions, are objectively true or false in themselves. Combined with his view that ordinary objects are identical to true existential propositions, this implies that ordinary objects which possess value do so intrinsically: they are true existential propositions that involve the concept “good.” Thus, an object’s status as good or bad (or, in the aesthetic realm, beautiful or ugly) depends on nothing outside of itself—neither its causes and effects nor its relationship to human beings, their preferences, or their judgments. It depends solely on the involvement of “good” as a concept, or, in the idiom of existence, a property.

Ethical propositions, then, differ from non-ethical ones only in virtue of the kinds of concepts they involve. Specifically, ethical propositions involve a range of unique concepts that we call “ethical” or “moral,” such as “good,” “right,” “duty,” etc. The most fundamental of these is “good”; the others count as moral concepts/properties only because they bear logical relationships (in the broad sense of “relations of meaning”) to “good.” This point will be discussed further below. For now, we will focus on Moore’s views concerning the nature of “good” itself.

The central thesis of Principia Ethica is that “good” is a simple, non-natural concept (or property). As we shall see (in Section 3b), it is not completely clear what Moore means by “non-natural.” What he means by “simple” however, is clear enough; so we shall start with that. For something to be ontologically simple (which is the sense in question here) is for it to possess no parts, to admit of no divisions or distinctions in its own constitution. A simple is not made up out of anything, and thus cannot be broken down into anything. Simples are therefore unanalyzable. In the case of “good,” it is a concept not made up of other concepts. Consequently it cannot be analyzed—broken down into constituents—in the way that “bachelor” can (see Section 2b). Moore illustrates the situation by comparing “good” to color concepts like “yellow.” Color concepts cannot be known by analytic description, but only by acquaintance, that is, direct cognition. Attempts at description or definition (that is, analysis) such as “yellow is a color brighter than blue,” fail to capture the essence of yellow. Likewise, purported analyses of “good,” in terms concepts like “pleasure” or “desire” or “evolutionary progress,” fail to capture what is meant by “good.”

b. The Open Question Argument and the Naturalistic Fallacy

Moore demonstrates the unanalyzability of “good” by what has come to be known as “the open question argument”: for any definition of “good”—“good(ness) is X”—it makes sense to ask whether goodness really is X, and whether X really is good. For instance, if we say “goodness is pleasure,” it makes sense to ask, “is goodness really pleasure?” and “is pleasure truly good?” Moore’s point is that every attempt at definition leaves it an open question as to what good really is. But this could be the case only if the definition failed to capture all of what is meant by “good.” Consider the case discussed above: “a bachelor is an unmarried man.” Here it makes no sense to respond “yes, but is a bachelor really an unmarried man?” or “but is every unmarried man really a bachelor?” The reason it doesn’t is that the full meaning of “bachelor” is captured by “unmarried man.” On the other hand, the reason it makes sense to ask these kinds of questions about purported definitions of “good” is that they fail to capture its full meaning. Since this is true of every purported definition of “good,” “good” cannot be defined; it can only be recognized in particular cases through acts of intuitive apprehension.

On this account, any ethical theory that attempts to define the good—and nearly all of them do—errs. Moore famously dubbed this particular error “the naturalistic fallacy.” In general, the fallacy “consists in identifying the simple notion which we mean by ‘good’ with some other notion” (Moore 1903a, 58); or, negatively, the “failure to distinguish clearly that unique and indefinable quality which we mean by good” (Moore 1903a, 59). To this extent, it is clear what Moore means by “the naturalistic fallacy.” However, his choice of “naturalistic” to describe this error is quite puzzling, as is his description of “good” as a non-natural property. In the modern era, “nature” has frequently been used as a synonym for the material world, the world studied by the natural sciences. Accordingly, “naturalistic” has usually been reserved for philosophical views amenable to the natural sciences, views like scientism, empiricism, materialism, and so on. In the Principia, Moore’s direct statements about the meanings of “natural,” “naturalistic,” etc., are in keeping with this norm. At one point, he describes “nature” (and hence the natural) as “that which is the subject-matter of the natural sciences and also of psychology” (Moore 1903a, Ch. 2 § 26). He also offers two alternative characterizations of the natural. The first is in terms of temporality, the second in terms of the capacity for independent existence in time (this latter applies specifically to properties). Even here he does not depart from the norm, for the objects of scientific inquiry are usually taken to be temporal individuals such as events or material individuals at varying levels of granularity (atoms, molecules, cells, “ordinary middle-sized objects,” planets, etc.).

On the one hand, then, Moore’s use of “natural” seems to be unremarkable. What is peculiar, on the other hand, is his use of “naturalistic” to describe the fallacy of equating “good” with any other concept. Moore’s “naturalistic fallacy” is not a matter of mistaking the temporal for the atemporal. Neither is it a matter of mistaking the empirical and the scientific for the non-empirical and non-scientific. This description might apply to hedonistic views that equate good with pleasure, since pleasure can be treated as an object of empirical study either for psychology or physiology. However, Moore means to charge even metaphysical theories of ethics—such as those of Aristotle, Aquinas and Kant—with commiting the naturalistic fallacy (cf. Moore 1903a, Ch. 4), and none of these equates goodness with something empirical or scientific in the modern sense. In fact, the naturalistic fallacy is really just a matter of mistaking the non-synonymous for the synonymous (thus William Frankena suggested in an important 1939 paper that it should be called “the definist fallacy”), and this has nothing to do with the distinction between the natural and the non-natural per se, as that distinction is normally understood.

All this points to the fact that either Moore has a much broader understanding of “natural” than he admits to in the Principia, or “naturalistic fallacy” is not an apt name for the phenomenon at issue. In the Principia, Moore seems prepared to accept the latter possibility when he claims “I do not care about the name: what I do care about is the fallacy. It does not matter what we call it, provided we recognise it when we meet with it” (Moore 1903a, Ch. 1, § 12). However the natural/non-natural terminology must have meant more to him than he let on, for he retained it throughout his career, even parting ways with ordinary usage to do so. This occurs in a 1922 paper on “The Conception of Intrinsic Value.” Here, Moore holds that value concepts alone are to be counted as non-natural, so that “non-natural” is practically equivalent to “moral” and “natural” to “non-moral.” Thus, in the end, it seems that Moore did have a much broader understanding of “natural”—and a correspondingly narrower conception of “non-natural”—than is articulated in the Principia.

c. Ideal Utilitarianism

Although it is the focus of his later book Ethics, only a single chapter of the Principia is given to what Moore called “practical ethics.” This is the area of ethics that has to do with behavior, and hence deals in concepts like “right,” “permissible,” “obligatory,” and the like. In both places, Moore promotes a view that has come to be called “ideal utilitarianism.”

Moore’s account of intrinsic value is limited to objects; it does not include actions. Actions, for Moore, possess value only instrumentally, insofar as they are productive of good consequences. Thus “right,” “duty,” and “virtue” are different ways of labeling actions (or dispositions to act) that are useful as means to good ends. They differ in meaning only insofar as the secondary details of the causal situation differ: “duty” marks a action as productive of more good than any possible alternative, “right” or “permissible” marks an action as productive of no less good than any possible alternative (Moore 1903a, Ch. 5, § 89), while virtues are dispositions to perform particularly unattractive duties:

as duties from expedient actions, so virtues are distinguished from other useful dispositions, not by any superior utility, but by the fact that they are dispositions, which it is particularly useful to praise and to sanction, because there are strong and common temptations to neglect the actions to which they lead. (Moore 1903a, Ch. 5, § 103)

Moore’s view is that there is no important difference in meaning between concepts like “duty” “right” and “virtue” on the one hand, and “expedient” or “useful” on the other. In this he agrees with the classic utilitarians Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. However, whereas classic utilitarianism is hedonistic (that is, it defines good in terms of pleasure), Moore defends the sui generis status of “good” (see Section 3a). Moore’s utilitarianism is not, therefore, hedonistic. Instead, it is said to be ideal. To understand what this means, we must note two features of Moore’s view.

First, Moore’s utilitarianism is pluralistic. Since, on Moore’s account, “good” is a property/concept whose meaning is completely independent of any others, it can be instanced in any number of wholes—objects or states of affairs—of a variety of types. This means that many different kinds of objects can have intrinsic value—not just states of pleasure, as the classic utilitarians have it.

Second, “good” for Moore is a degreed property—one object or state of affairs can have more or less value than another. This is implicit in the way Moore distinguished between “duty” and “right.” “Duty” concerns producing the most good possible, while “right” concerns producing no less good than other options. Both definitions assume that possible outcomes (states of affairs) can be ranked in respect of their degrees of value. This is made explicit in Chapter 6 of the Principia, where Moore articulates his conception of an ideal state of affairs. In general, Moore says, an ideal state is one that is “good in itself in a high degree” (Moore 1903a, Ch. 6, § 110). Ideal utilitarianism, therefore, will be a brand of utilitarianism in which actions are to be ordered not to the greatest happiness or pleasure, but to those states of affairs possessing the highest degree of good.

Indeed, as Moore has set things up, duty will always be directed toward some ideal state (toward the state with the highest degree of good). Thus, to know which states are ideal, and, more specifically, which are most valuable and hence the most ideal, is crucial for practical ethics. According to Moore, the most valuable states we know of are the pleasures of personal relationships and aesthetic enjoyment. Thus, he concludes, “the ultimate and fundamental truth of Moral Philosophy” is that

it is only for the sake of these things [that is, the two ideal states of aesthetic and interpersonal enjoyment]—in order that as much of them as possible may at some time exist—that any one can be justified in performing any public or private duty; that they are the raison d’être of virtue; that it is they—these complex wholes themselves, and not any constituent or characteristic of them—that form the rational ultimate end of human action and the sole criterion of social progress. (Moore 1903a, Ch. 6, § 113)

d. The Influence of Moore’s Ethical Theory

Moore’s ethical theory had a tremendous influence both within and beyond the academy. Within the academy, non-cognitive theories of ethics dominated until nearly 1960. This was the logical consequence of adapting Moore’s ethical theory to a naturalistic worldview. Both his own and subsequent generations of philosophers took to heart Moore’s treatment of moral value as non-natural and his corresponding refusal to allow any characterization of good in natural terms. In doing so, however, they either failed to recognize or simply ignored the fact that Moore’s use of “natural” etc. was somewhat idiosyncratic. Taking these terms in their standard sense, Moore’s claims about “good” indicated that it was not merely indefinable, but unknowable by any scientific or “natural” means. Together with a scientistic outlook that restricted either the knowable or the existent to the scientifically verifiable, this yielded the view that “good” was unknowable.

It was essentially this view—albeit given a linguistic twist—that provided the theme upon which the most prominent ethical theories of the early- to mid-1900s counted as so many variations. This began with the logical positivist treatment of ethics. According to the logical positivists’ “verifiability principle of meaning,” the meaning of a proposition is its manner of empirical verification. If a proposition cannot be verified empirically, it is thereby revealed as meaningless. Given the Moorean characterization of “good” as non-natural and the usual sense of “non-natural” as connoting, among other things, “non-empirical,” the verification principle made ethical propositions meaningless. Still, ethical discourse obviously plays an important role in human life. According to the logical positivists, this was to be explained by treating ethical propositions not as statements of fact, but as expressions of emotion. For example, “honesty is good” is to be taken as equivalent to “hooray for honesty!” This view, commonly called “emotivism,” was popularized by A. J. Ayer in his book Language, Truth and Logic (Ayer 1936), and later modified by C. L. Stevenson (1944, 1963).

To an extent, emotivism had been anticipated in Moore’s treatment of practical ethics, in his view that

the true distinction between duties and expedient actions is not that the former are actions which it is in any sense more useful or obligatory or better to perform, but that they are actions which it is more useful to praise and to enforce by sanctions, since they are actions which there is a temptation to omit. (Moore 1903a, Ch. 5, § 101)

In other words, the language of practical ethics adds to non-ethical language only the connotation of approval or disapproval and their consequent “hortatory force” (cf. Daly 1996, 45-47). In emotivisim this claim was extended to all ethical discourse.

The larger part of the mid-century debate over the status of ethical claims was taken up with creative rejections of emotivism which were nonetheless in keeping with the basic Moorean disjunction between the moral and the natural(/empirical/scientific). Such alternatives came from Stuart Hamphire (1949), J. O. Urmson (1950), Stephen Toulmin (1950), and R. M. Hare (1952). British and American philosophers began to part ways with the Moorean disjunction only in the late 1950s and early 1960s, due largely to the work of Elizabeth Anscombe (Anscombe 1958) and Phillipa Foot (1958, 1959, 1961).

Beyond the academy, Moore’s emphasis on the value of personal relationships and aesthetic experiences endeared him to members of the Bloomsbury group, who embraced Moore as their patron saint. Bloomsbury was a group of avant-garde writers, artists, and intellectuals that proved to be immensely influential in culture beyond the academy. The group included (among others) Clive Bell, Roger Fry, Desmond McCarthy, John Maynard Keynes, and Leonard and Virginia Woolf. Many of the Bloomsbury men were also members of the Cambridge Apostles, and had first met each other and Moore in that context. Moore had been elected to this secret student society in 1894. As members of Bloomsbury, they embraced Moore’s idealization of friendship and aesthetic enjoyment as the highest human goods, and, through their own example and through their work, conveyed at least some of Moore’s views and values beyond the halls of academia and into the broader culture.

However, they also used Moore’s intuition-based moral epistemology as a justification for flouting the mores of their culture, especially in the area of sexual ethics. In fact, on account of Bloomsbury’s reputation for moral laxity, Moore’s views were often unfairly criticized as encouraging libertine behavior. This is clearly a case of guilt by association, as Moore himself never claimed that “free love” was a good. The closest he comes to the topic is in discussing social conventions about chastity as an example of rules that might, under certain circumstances, be suspended (Moore 1903a, ch. 5, §§ 95-96). However, far from endorsing that they actually be suspended, he argues that it is obligatory to obey the conventions of one’s society, since this will usually generate a state of greater good (in the form of social harmony) than violating them.

The situation with Bloomsbury illustrates the greatest weakness of Moore’s ethical system. It is not a theoretical weakness, but a practical one. From a theoretical perspective, intuitionism is invulnerable, and it is invulnerable because intuition is unverifiable—if someone claims to have an intuition that such and such is the case, there’s nothing anyone can do to prove or disprove it. However, because it is unverifiable, intuition can be used to justify anything. This is the practical problem with intuitionist ethics. Of course, the problem is not unique to Moore’s version of intuitionism, but attaches to intuitionism in specie.

4. Philosophical Methodology

Moore is usually regarded as an important methodological innovator. In fact his method of philosophical analysis is supposed to have been a formative inspiration for the analytic movement in philosophy. However, it is a bit misleading to speak of “Moore’s philosophical method.” Moore was what we might call an occasional philosopher. By his own admission, he possessed no innate drive to develop a systematic philosophy; rather, he was agitated into philosophizing only by the bizarre challenges some philosophers’ claims posed to his commonsense beliefs:

I do not think that the world or the sciences would ever have suggested to me any philosophical problems. What has suggested philosophical problems to me is things which other philosophers have said about the world or the sciences. (Moore 1942a, 14)

In the Library of Living Philosophers volume on Moore, V.J. McGill criticizes Moore’s piecemeal approach to philosophy. He rightly notes that Moore attempted to develop no grand system of philosophy, but worked instead in a few specific areas, for example, ethics, perception, and philosophical method. McGill blames Moore’s approach to philosophy on his commitment to a method which was simply not suited to deal with other sorts of philosophical issues. In his reply to McGill, however, Moore rejects this idea:

it is, of course true that there are ever so many interesting philosophical problems on which I have never said a word ... Mr. McGill suggests that the reason why I have not dealt with some of these other questions may have been that I was wedded to certain particular methods, and that these methods were not suitable for dealing with them. But I think I can assure him that this was not the case. I started discussing certain kinds of questions, because they happened to be what interested me most; and I only adopted certain particular methods (so far as I had adopted them) because they seemed to me suitable for those kinds of questions. I had no preference for any method…. (Moore 1942b, 676)

In a sense, then, Moore did not have a method. But, of course, he did have a way of going about his philosophizing, and one might call this “Moore’s method.” In this case, the “method” would consist, first, in tackling isolated philosophical problems rather than trying to build a philosophical system. Second, in tackling one of these isolated problems, it would involve the attempt to get very clear on what was meant by the propositions and concepts essential to stating the problem—in other words, the propositions and concepts would have to be analyzed. Likewise with the propositions and concepts involved in the answer (or possible answers).

In point of historical fact, Moore’s use of analysis to solve isolated philosophical problems—and so his “method”—proved to have a greater impact on philosophy than any of his developed theories in metaphysics, epistemology, or ethics. Though his early views about truth and propositions provided a necessary metaphysical and epistemological departure from British Idealism, these merely facilitated the rise of analytic philosophy. The substance of the movement came from Moore’s use of analysis as a method. Indeed, though use of the word “analysis” in philosophy antedates Moore, it was Moore who first used it in the sense that ultimately gave the movement its name.

Unfortunately, much of Moore’s influence in this regard was based on a mistake. It was mentioned above that the empirical equivalence of definition and analysis was a source of confusion for Moore’s contemporaries. Despite Moore’s best efforts to explain otherwise, many took him to have invented and endorsed linguistic analysis. Norman Malcolm represents this common misconception when he says, “The essence of Moore’s technique of refuting philosophical statements consists in pointing out that these statements go against ordinary language” (Malcolm 1942, 349). Malcolm goes on to tie Moore’s entire philosophical legacy to his “linguistic method:”

Moore’s great historical role consists in the fact that he has been perhaps the first philosopher to sense that any philosophical statement that violates ordinary language is false, and consistently to defend ordinary language against its philosophical violators” (Malcolm 1942, 368)

But Moore explicitly rejected the idea that his analyses had been in any important sense “linguistic.” “In my usage,” he insisted, “the analysanda must be a concept, or idea, or proposition, and not a verbal expression” (Moore 1942b, 663 f.):

I never intended to use the word [“analysis”] in such a way that the analysandum would be a verbal expression. When I have talked of analyzing anything, what I have talked of analyzing has always been an idea or concept or proposition, and not a verbal expression; that is to say, if I talked of analyzing a “proposition,” I was always using “proposition” in such a sense that no verbal expression (no sentence, for instance), can be a “proposition,” in that sense. (Moore 1942b, 661)

Our survey of Moore’s metaphysics in Section 2b makes it clear enough that a Moorean proposition is anything but a linguistic entity. How, then, did this misunderstanding arise? Even a brief survey of Moore’s work will reveal that he often used terms such as “meaning,” “definition,” and “predicate” to describe what he was dealing with or looking for in his philosophical activities, and it is easy to see how these suggest that he was engaged in some linguistic enterprise. In a particularly glaring example from Principia Ethica, Moore identifies the object of his of study in clearly grammatical terms: “My discussion hitherto has fallen under two main heads. Under the first, I tried to shew what “good”—the adjective “good”—means” (Moore 1903a, Ch. 5, § 86). In this case, it seems that Moore himself conflated a linguistic entity—the adjective “good”—with a conceptual one.

With characteristic humility, Moore was quick to count himself as partially responsible for the linguistic interpretation of his method. “I have often,” he admitted, “in giving analyses, used this word ‘means’ and thus given a false impression; …” (Moore 1942b, 664 f.). Though the linguistic interpretation of Moore persisted until well after his death, recent scholarship has continued to hammer the point home that this is a mistake, and the message seems to have finally been heard.

Even apart from the linguistic error, however, the general contours of Moore’s genuine “method” seem to have had a lasting impact of their own. In his recent work on the history of analytic philosophy, Scott Soames counts as two of the movement’s three characteristic features “an implicit commitment…to the ideals of clarity, rigor, and argumentation” (Soames 2003, xiii) and “a widespread presumption…that it is often possible to make philosophical progress by intensively investigating a small, circumscribed range of philosophical issues while holding broader, systematic issues in abeyance” (Soames 2003, xv), and among its two most important achievements he includes “the recognition that philosophical speculation must be grounded in pre-philosophical thought” (Soames 2003, xi). Each of these can be traced directly back to Moore and his “method.”

5. Moore’s Influence and Character

It cannot be doubted that Moore was one of the most influential philosophers of the early twentieth century. It is peculiar, though, that his influence seems to have had little to do with his actual views. Though his early views about truth and propositions influenced Bertrand Russell for a time, they have long since ceased to play a role in mainstream philosophical discussions. The same can be said of his views in ethics and, except in the very general respects mentioned by Soames, philosophical methodology. Moreover, even when the influence of Moore’s ethical and methodological views was at its highest, there remains the fact that much of the detailed content of his views was ignored by those who claimed to be influenced by them. For both the “ordinary language” branch of analytic philosophy and the Bloomsbury group, Moore’s views were influential mainly in the sense that they provided forms into which they could pour their own content. And yet Moore himself was revered by all.

This puzzle about Moore’s influence has been addressed by Paul Levy (Levy 1979), who argues that Moore's influence was due more to his character than to his views. And, in fact, the uniqueness of Moore’s character is frequently mentioned by those who knew him and have written about him. G. J. Warnock, for instance, would seem to agree with Levy when he says:

…special notice should be paid to the character of Moore…it was not solely by reason of his intellectual gifts that Moore differed so greatly from his immediate predecessors, or influenced so powerfully his own contemporaries. He was not, and never had the least idea that he was, a much cleverer man than McTaggart … or Bradley. It was in point of character that he was different, and importantly so. (Warnock 1958, 12)

Foremost among his virtues were his unwavering honesty and his devotion to clarity and truth. Moore was never afraid to appear silly or naïve in his search for truth, and so he always said exactly what he thought in the best way he knew how. He was never afraid to admit an error. He gave no appearance of trying to promote either himself or his own agenda or system. This was remarkably refreshing in a context dominated by a philosophical system that had achieved the status of orthodoxy. He held both himself and others to exacting intellectual standards while at the same time exhibiting a spirit of great generosity and kindness in his personal relationships. Gilbert Ryle, the most prominent Cambridge philosopher in the generation after Moore, describes Moore’s significance this way:

He gave us courage not by making concessions, but by making no concessions to our youth or our shyness. He treated us as corrigible and therefore as responsible thinkers. He would explode at our mistakes and muddles with just that genial ferocity with which he would explode at the mistakes and muddles of philosophical high-ups, and with just the genial ferocity with which he would explode at mistakes and muddles of his own. (Ryle 1971, 270)

Similar reports come from Moore’s associates outside of academic philosophy. For instance, Leonard Woolf (a member of Bloomsbury and the Apostles) recalls:

There was in him an element which can, I think, be accurately called greatness, a combination of mind and character and behaviour, of thought and feeling, which made him qualitatively different from anyone else I have ever known. I recognize it in only one or two of the many famous dead men whom Ecclesiaasticus and others enjoin us to praise for one reason or another. (Woolf 1960, 131)

There is no doubt that Moore’s character captured a certain philosophical ideal established by Socrates long ago. Whatever we make of Moore’s views, we can be grateful for his character and whatever influence it had and continues to have.

6. References and Further Readings

The most complete bibliography of Moore’s writings is found in the 1971 edition of The Philosophy of G. E. Moore (listed, as “Schilpp, ed. 1942” in section b, below).

a. Primary Sources

  • Moore, G. E. 1899: “The Nature of Judgment,” Mind 8, 176-93. Reprinted in Moore 1993, 1-19.
  • Moore, G. E. 1901-2: “Truth” in J. Baldwin (ed.) Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology, London: Macmillan. Reprinted in Moore 1993, 20-2.
  • Moore, G. E. 1903a: Principia Ethica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Moore, G. E. 1903b: “The Refutation of Idealism” Mind 12, 433-53. Reprinted in Moore 1993, 23-44.
  • Moore, G. E. 1912: Ethics, London: Williams & Norgate.
  • Moore, G. E. 1922a: Philosophical Studies, K. Paul, London: Trench, Trubner & Co.
  • Moore, G. E. 1922b: “The Conception of Intrinsic Value” in Moore 1922a.
  • Moore, G. E. 1925: “A Defense of Common Sense” in J. H. Muirhead ed., Contemporary British Philosophy, London: Allen and Unwin, 193-223. Reprinted in Moore 1959, 126-148, and Moore 1993, 106-33.
  • Moore, G. E. 1939: “Proof of an External World,” Proceedings of the British Academy 25, 273-300. Reprinted in Moore 1993, 147-70.
  • Moore, G. E. 1942a: “An Autobiography,” in Schilpp ed., 1942, 3-39.
  • Moore, G. E. 1942b: “A Reply to My Critics,” in Schilpp ed., 1942, 535-677.
  • Moore, G. E. 1953: Some Main Problems of Philosophy, New York: Macmillan.
  • Moore, G. E. 1959: Philosophical Papers, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Moore, G. E. 1993: G. E. Moore: Selected Writings, ed. Thomas Baldwin, London: Routledge.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ambrose and Lazerowitz (eds.). 1970: G. E. Moore: Essays in Retrospect, London: Allen and Unwin.
  • Anscombe, Elizabeth. 1958: “Modern Moral Philosophy,” Philosophy: The Journal of the Royal Institute of Philosophy, vol. 33, no. 124, 1-19
  • Ayer, A. J. 1936, Language, Truth, and Logic, London: Gollancz.
  • Ayer, A. J. 1971: Russell and Moore: The Analytical Heritage, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Baldwin, T. 1990: G. E. Moore, London: Routledge.
  • Baldwin, T. 1991: “The Identity Theory of Truth,” Mind, New Series, Vol. 100, No. 1, 35-52.
  • Bell, David. 1999: “The Revolution of Moore and Russell: A Very British Coup?” in Anthony O’Hear (ed.), German Philosophy Since Kant, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Daly, Cahal B. 1996: Moral Philosophy in Britain: From Bradley to Wittgenstein, Dublin: Four Courts Press.
  • Foot, Phillipa. 1958: “Moral Arguments,” Mind, Vol. 67, 502-513.
  • Foot, Phillipa. 1959: “Moral Beliefs,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Vol. 59, 83-104.
  • Foot, Phillipa. “Goodness and Choice,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplemental Vol. 35, 45-61.
  • Frankena, William. 1939: “The Naturalistic Fallacy,” Mind, Vol. 48, 464-477.
  • Hampshire, Stuart. 1949: “Fallacies in Moral Philosophy,” Mind, Vol. 58, 466-482.
  • Hare, R. M. 1952: The Language of Morals, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hutchinson, Brian. 2001: G. E. Moore’s Ethical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Keynes, J. M. 1949: “My Early Beliefs” in Two Memoirs, London: Hart-Davis.
  • Levy, P. 1979: Moore: G. E. Moore and the Cambridge Apostles, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewy, Casmir. 1964: “G. E. Moore on the Naturalistic Fallacy,” Proceedings of the British Academy, vol. 50, 251-262.
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Author Information

Aaron Preston
Malone College
U. S. A.

Gottlob Frege (1848—1925)

FregeGottlob Frege was a German logician, mathematician and philosopher who played a crucial role in the emergence of modern logic and analytic philosophy. Frege's logical works were revolutionary, and are often taken to represent the fundamental break between contemporary approaches and the older, Aristotelian tradition. He invented modern quantificational logic, and created the first fully axiomatic system for logic, which was complete in its treatment of propositional and first-order logic, and also represented the first treatment of higher-order logic. In the philosophy of mathematics, he was one of the most ardent proponents of logicism, the thesis that mathematical truths are logical truths, and presented influential criticisms of rival views such as psychologism and formalism. His theory of meaning, especially his distinction between the sense and reference of linguistic expressions, was groundbreaking in semantics and the philosophy of language. He had a profound and direct influence on such thinkers as Russell, Carnap and Wittgenstein. Frege is often called the founder of modern logic, and he is sometimes even heralded as the founder of analytic philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Contributions to Logic
  3. Contributions to the Philosophy of Mathematics
  4. The Theory of Sense and Reference
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Frege's Own Works
    2. Important Secondary Works

1. Life and Works

Frege was born on November 8, 1848 in the coastal city of Wismar in Northern Germany. His full christened name was Friedrich Ludwig Gottlob Frege. Little is known about his youth. His father, Karl Alexander Frege, and his mother, Auguste (Bialloblotzsky) Frege, both worked at a girl's private school founded in part by Karl. Both were also principals of the school at various points: Karl held the position until his death 1866, when Auguste took over until her death in 1878. The German writer Arnold Frege, born in Wismar in 1852, may have been Frege's younger brother, but this has not been confirmed. Frege probably lived in Wismar until 1869; in the years from 1864-1869 he is known to have studied at the Gymnasium in Wismar.

In Spring 1869, Frege began studies at the University of Jena. There, he studied chemistry, philosophy and mathematics, and must have solidly impressed Ernst Abbe in mathematics, who later become of Frege's benefactors. After four semesters, Frege transferred to the University of Göttingen, where he studied mathematics and physics, as well as philosophy of religion under Hermann Lotze. (Lotze is sometimes thought to have had a profound impact on Frege's philosophical views.) In late 1873, Frege finished his doctoral dissertation, under the guidance of Ernst Schering, entitled Über eine geometrische Darstellung der imaginären Gebilde in der Ebene ("On a Geometrical Representation of Imaginary Figures in a Plane"), and received his Ph.D.

In 1874, with the recommendation of Ernst Abbe, Frege received a lectureship at the University of Jena, where he stayed the rest of his intellectual life. His position was unsalaried during his first five years, and he was supported by his mother. Frege's Habilitationsschrift, entitled Rechnungsmethoden, die auf eine Erweiterung des Grössenbegriffes gründen ("Methods of Calculation Based upon An Amplification of the Concept of Magnitude,"), was included with the material submitted to obtain the position. It involves the theory of complex mathematical functions, and contains seeds of Frege's advances in logic and the philosophy of mathematics.

Frege had a heavy teaching load during his first few years at Jena. However, he still had time to work on his first major work in logic, which was published in 1879 under the title Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens ("Concept-Script: A Formula Language for Pure Thought Modeled on That of Arithmetic"). Therein, Frege presented for the first time his invention of a new method for the construction of a logical language. Upon the publication of the Begriffsschrift, he was promoted to ausserordentlicher Professor, his first salaried position. However, the book was not well-reviewed by Frege's contemporaries, who apparently found its two-dimensional logical notation difficult to comprehend, and failed to see its advantages over previous approaches, such as that of Boole.

Sometime after the publication of the Begriffsschrift, Frege was married to Margaret Lieseburg (1856-1905). They had at least two children, who unfortunately died young. Years later they adopted a son, Alfred. However, little else is known about Frege's family life.

Frege had aimed to use the logical language of the Begriffsschrift to carry out his logicist program of attempting to show that all of the basic truths of arithmetic could be derived from purely logical axioms. However, on the advice of Carl Stumpf, and given the poor reception of the Begriffsschrift, Frege decided to write a work in which he would describe his logicist views informally in ordinary language, and argue against rival views. The result was his Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik ("The Foundations of Arithmetic"), published in 1884. However, this work seems to have been virtually ignored by most of Frege's contemporaries.

Soon thereafter, Frege began working on his attempt to derive the basic laws of arithmetic within his logical language. However, his work was interrupted by changes to his views. In the late 1880s and early 1890s Frege developed new and interesting theories regarding the nature of language, functions and concepts, and philosophical logic, including a novel theory of meaning based on the distinction between sense and reference. These views were published in influential articles such as "Funktion und Begriff" ("Function and Concept", 1891), "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" ("On Sense and Reference", 1892) and "Über Begriff und Gegenstand" ("On Concept and Object", 1892). This maturation of Frege's semantic and philosophical views lead to changes in his logical language, forcing him to abandon an almost completed draft of his work in logic and the foundations of mathematics. However, in 1893, Frege finally finished a revised volume, employing a slightly revised logical system. This was his magnum opus, Grundgesetze der Arithmetik ("Basic Laws of Arithmetic"), volume I. In the first volume, Frege presented his new logical language, and proceeded to use it to define the natural numbers and their properties. His aim was to make this the first of a three volume work; in the second and third, he would move on to the definition of real numbers, and the demonstration of their properties.

Again, however, Frege's work was unfavorably reviewed by his contemporaries. Nevertheless, he was promoted once again in 1894, now to the position of Honorary Ordinary Professor. It is likely that Frege was offered a position as full Professor, but turned it down to avoid taking on additional administrative duties. His new position was unsalaried, but he was able to support himself and his family with a stipend from the Carl Zeiss Stiftung, a foundation that gave money to the University of Jena, and with which Ernst Abbe was intimately involved.

Because of the unfavorable reception of his earlier works, Frege was forced to arrange to have volume II of the Grundgesetze published at his own expense. It was not until 1902 that Frege was able to make such arrangements. However, while the volume was already in the publication process, Frege received a letter from Bertrand Russell, informing him that it was possible to prove a contradiction in the logical system of the first volume of the Grundgesetze, which included a naive calculus for classes. For more information, see the article on "Russell's Paradox". Frege was, in his own words, "thunderstruck". He was forced to quickly prepare an appendix in response. For the next couple years, he continued to do important work. A series of articles entitled "Über die Grundlagen der Geometrie," ("On the Foundations of Geometry") was published between 1903 and 1906, representing Frege's side of a debate with David Hilbert over the nature of geometry and the proper construction and understanding of axiomatic systems within mathematics.

However, around 1906, probably due to some combination of poor health, the early loss of his wife in 1905, frustration with his failure to find an adequate solution to Russell's paradox, and disappointment over the continued poor reception of his work, Frege seems to have lost his intellectual steam. He produced very little work between 1906 and his retirement in 1918. However, he continued to influence others during this period. Russell had included an appendix on Frege in his 1903 Principles of Mathematics. It is from this that Frege came be to be a bit wider known, including to an Austrian student studying engineering in Manchester, England, named Ludwig Wittgenstein. Wittgenstein studied the work of Frege and Russell closely, and in 1911, he wrote to both of them concerning his own solution to Russell's paradox. Frege invited him to Jena to discuss his views. Wittgenstein did so in late 1911. The two engaged in a philosophical debate, and while Wittgenstein reported that Frege "wiped the floor" with him, Frege was sufficiently impressed with Wittgenstein that he suggested that he go to Cambridge to study with Russell--a suggestion that had profound importance for the history of philosophy. Moreover, Rudolf Carnap was one of Frege's students from 1910 to 1913, and doubtlessly Frege had significant influence on Carnap's interest in logic and semantics and his subsequent intellectual development and successes.

After his retirement in 1918, Frege moved to Bad Kleinen, near Wismar, and managed to publish a number of important articles, "Der Gedanke" ("The Thought", 1918), "Der Verneinung" ("Negation", 1918), and "Gedankengefüge" ("Compound Thoughts", 1923). However, these were not wholly new works, but later drafts of works he had initiated in the 1890s. In 1924, a year before his death, Frege finally returned to the attempt to understand the foundations of arithmetic. However, by this time, he had completely given up on his logicism, concluding that the paradoxes of class or set theory made it impossible. He instead attempted to develop a new theory of the nature of arithmetic based on Kantian pure intuitions of space. However, he was not able to write much or publish anything about his new theory. Frege died on July 26, 1925 at the age of 76.

At the time of his death, Frege's own works were still not very widely known. He did not live to see the profound impact he would have on the emergence of analytic philosophy, nor to see his brand of logic--due to the championship of Russell--virtually wholly supersede earlier forms of logic. However, in bequeathing his unpublished work to his adopted son, Alfred, he wrote prophetically, "I believe there are things here which will one day be prized much more highly than they are now. Take care that nothing gets lost." Alfred later gave Frege's papers to Heinrich Scholz of the University of Münster for safekeeping. Unfortunately, however, they were destroyed in an Allied bombing raid on March 25, 1945. Although Scholz had made copies of some of the more important pieces, a good portion of Frege's unpublished works were lost.

Although he was a fierce, sometimes even satirical, polemicist, Frege himself was a quiet, reserved man. He was right-wing in his political views, and like many conservatives of his generation in Germany, he is known to have been distrustful of foreigners and rather anti-semitic. Himself Lutheran, Frege seems to have wanted to see all Jews expelled from Germany, or at least deprived of certain political rights. This distasteful feature of Frege's personality has gravely disappointed some of Frege's intellectual progeny.

2. Contributions to Logic

Trained as a mathematician, Frege's interests in logic grew out of his interests in the foundations of arithmetic. Early in his career, Frege became convinced that the truths of arithmetic are logical, analytic truths, agreeing with Leibniz, and disagreeing with Kant, who thought that arithmetical knowledge was grounded in "pure intuition", as well as more empiricist thinkers such as J. S. Mill, who thought that arithmetic was grounded in observation. In other words, Frege subscribed to logicism. His logicism was modest in one sense, but very ambitious in others. Frege's logicism was limited to arithmetic; unlike other important historical logicists, such as Russell, Frege did not think that geometry was a branch of logic. However, Frege's logicism was very ambitious in another regard, as he believed that one could prove all of the truths of arithmetic deductively from a limited number of logical axioms. Indeed, Frege himself set out to demonstrate all of the basic laws of arithmetic within his own system of logic.

Frege concurred with Leibniz that natural language was unsuited to such a task. Thus, Frege sought to create a language that would combine the tasks of what Leibniz called a "calculus ratiocinator" and "lingua characterica", that is, a logically perspicuous language in which logical relations and possible inferences would be clear and unambiguous. Frege's own term for such a language, "Begriffsschrift" was likely borrowed from a paper on Leibniz's ideas written by Adolf Trendelenburg. Although there had been attempts to fashion at least the core of such a language made by Boole and others working in the Leibnizian tradition, Frege found their work unsuitable for a number of reasons. Boole's logic used some of the same signs used in mathematics, except with different logical meanings. Frege found this unacceptable for a language which was to be used to demonstrate mathematical truths, because the signs would be ambiguous. Boole's logic, though innovative in some respects, was weak in others. It was divided into a "primary logic" and "secondary logic", bifurcating its propositional and categorical elements, and could not deal adequately with multiple generalities. It analyzed propositions in terms of subject and predicate concepts, which Frege found to be imprecise and antiquated.

Frege saw the formulae of mathematics as the paradigm of clear, unambiguous writing. Frege's brand of logical language was modeled upon the international language of arithmetic, and it replaced the subject/predicate style of logical analysis with the notions of function and argument. In mathematics, an equation such as "f(x) = x2 + 1" states that f is a function that takes x as argument and yields as value the result of multiplying x by itself and adding one. In order to make his logical language suitable for purposes other than arithmetic, Frege expanded the notion of function to allow arguments and values other than numbers. He defined a concept (Begriff) as a function that has a truth-value, either of the abstract objects the True or the False, as its value for any object as argument. See below for more on Frege's understanding of concepts, functions and objects. The concept being human is understood as a function that has the True as value for any argument that is human, and the False as value for anything else. Suppose that "H( )" stands for this concept, and "a" is a constant for Aristotle, and "b" is a constant for the city of Boston. Then "H(a)" stands for the True, while "H(b)" stands for the False. In Frege's terminology, an object for which a concept has the True as value is said to "fall under" the concept.

The values of such concepts could then be used as arguments to other functions. In his own logical systems, Frege introduced signs standing for the negation and conditional functions. His own logical notation was two-dimensional. However, let us instead replace Frege's own notation with more contemporary notation. For Frege, the conditional function, "→" is understood as a function the value of which is the False if its first argument is the True and the second argument is anything other than the True, and is the True otherwise. Therefore, "H(b) → H(a)" stands for the True, while "H(a) → H(b)" stands for the False. The negation sign "~" stands for a function whose value is the True for every argument except the True, for which its value is the False. Conjunction and disjunction signs could then be defined from the negation and conditional signs. Frege also introduced an identity sign, standing for a function whose value is the True if the two arguments are the same object, and the False otherwise, and a sign, which he called "the horizontal," namely "—", that stands for a function that has the True as value for the True as argument, and has the False as value for any other argument.

Variables and quantifiers are used to express generalities. Frege understands quantifiers as "second-level concepts". The distinction between levels of functions involves what kind of arguments the functions take. In Frege's view, unlike objects, all functions are "unsaturated" insofar as they require arguments to yield values. But different sorts of functions require different sorts of arguments. Functions that take objects as argument, such as those referred to by "( ) + ( )" or "H( )", are called first-level functions. Functions that take first-level functions as argument are called second-level functions. The quantifier, "∀x(...x...)", is understood as standing for a function that takes a first-level function as argument, and yields the True as value if the argument-function has the True as value for all values of x, and has the False as value otherwise. Thus, "∀xH(x)" stands for the False, since the concept H( ) does not have the True as value for all arguments. However, "∀x[H(x) → H(x)]" stands for True, since the complex concept H( ) → H( ) does have the True as value for all arguments. The existential quantifier, now written "∃x(...x...)" is defined as "~∀x~(...x...)".

Those familiar with modern predicate logic will recognize the parallels between it and Frege's logic. Frege is often credited with having founded predicate logic. However, Frege's logic is in some ways different from modern predicate logic. As we have seen, a sign such as "H( )" is a sign for a function in the strictest sense, as are the conditional and negation connectives. Frege's conditional is not, like the modern connective, something that flanks statements to form a statement. Rather, it flanks terms for truth-values to form a term for a truth-value. Frege's "H(b) → H(a)" is simply a name for the True, by itself it does not assert anything. Therefore, Frege introduces a sign he called the "judgment stroke", ⊢, used to assert that what follows it stands for the True. Thus, while "H(b) → H(a)" is simply a term for a truth-value, "⊢ H(b) → H(a)" asserts that this truth-value is the True, or in this case, that if Boston is human, then Aristotle is human. Moreover, Frege's logical system was second-order. In addition to quantifiers ranging over objects, it also contained quantifiers ranging over first-level functions. Thus, "⊢∀xF[F(x)]" asserts that every object falls under at least one concept.

Frege's logic took the form of an axiomatic system. In fact, Frege was the first to take a fully axiomatic approach to logic, and the first even to suggest that inference rules ought to be explicitly formulated and distinguished from axioms. He began with a limited number of fixed axioms, introduced explicit inference rules, and aimed to derive all other logical truths (including, for him, the truths of arithmetic) from them. Frege's first logical system, that of the 1879 Begriffsschrift, had nine axioms (one of which was not independent), one explicit inference rule, and also employed a second and third inference rule implicitly. It represented the first axiomatization of logic, and was complete in its treatment of both propositional logic and first-order quantified logic. Unlike Frege's later system, the system of the Begriffsschrift was fully consistent. (It has since been proven impossible to devise a system for higher-order logic with a finite number of axioms that is both complete and consistent.)

In order to make deduction easier, in the 1893 logical system of the Grundgesetze, Frege used fewer axioms and more inference rules: seven and twelve, respectively, this time leaving nothing implicit. The Grundgesetze also expanded upon the system of the Begriffsschrift by adding axioms governing what Frege called the "value-ranges" (Werthverlaüfe) of functions, understood as objects corresponding to the complete argument-value mappings generated by functions. In the case of concepts, their value-ranges were identified with their extensions. While Frege did sometimes also refer to the extensions of concepts as "classes", he did not conceive of such classes as aggregates or collections. They were simply understood as objects corresponding to the complete argument-value mappings generated by concepts considered as functions. Frege then introduced two axioms dealing with these value-ranges. Most infamous was his Basic Law V, which asserts that the truth-value of the value-range of function F being identical to the value-range of function G is the same as the truth-value of F and G having the same value for every argument. If one conceives of value-ranges as argument-value mappings, then this certainly seems to be a plausible hypothesis. However, from it, it is possible to prove a strong theorem of class membership: that for any object x, that object is in the extension of concept F if and only if the value of F for x as argument is the True. Given that value-ranges themselves are taken to be objects, if the concept in question is that of being a extension of a concept not included in itself, one can conclude that the extension of this concept is in itself just in case it is not. Therefore, the logical system of the Grundgesetze was inconsistent due to Russell's Paradox. See the entry on Russell's Paradox for more details. However, the core of the system of the Grundgesetze, that is, the system minus the axioms governing value-ranges, is consistent and, like the system of the Begriffsschrift, is complete in its treatment of propositional logic and first-order predicate logic.

Given the extent to which it is taken granted today, it can be difficult to fully appreciate the truly innovative and radical approach Frege took to logic. Frege was the first to attempt to transcribe the old statements of categorical logic in a language employing variables, quantifiers and truth-functions. Frege was the first to understand a statement such as "all students are hardworking" as saying roughly the same as, "for all values of x, if x is a student, then x is hardworking". This made it possible to capture the logical connection between statements such as "either all students are hardworking or all students are intelligent" and "all students are either hardworking or intelligent" (for example, that the first implies the second). In earlier logical systems such as that of Boole, in which the propositional and quantificational elements were bifurcated, the connection was wholly lost. Moreover, Frege's logical system was the first to be able to capture statements of multiple generality, such as "every person loves some city" by using multiple quantifiers in the same logical formula. This too was impossible in all earlier logical systems. Indeed, Frege's "firsts" in logic are almost too numerous to list. We have seen here that he invented modern quantification theory, presented the first complete axiomatization of propositional and first-order "predicate" logic (the latter of which he invented outright), attempted the first formulation of higher-order logic, presented the first coherent and full analysis of variables and functions, first showed it possible to reduce all truth-functions to negation and the conditional, and made the first clear distinction between axioms and inference rules in a formal system. As we shall see, he also made advances in the logic of mathematics. It is small wonder that he is often heralded as the founder of modern logic.

On Frege's "philosophy of logic", logic is made true by a realm of logical entities. Logical functions, value-ranges, and the truth-values the True and the False, are thought to be objectively real entities, existing apart from the material and mental worlds. (As we shall see below, Frege was also committed to other logical entities such as senses and thoughts.) Logical axioms are true because they express true thoughts about these entities. Thus, Frege denied the popular view that logic is without content and without metaphysical commitment. Frege was also a harsh critic of psychologism in logic: the view that logical truths are truths about psychology. While Frege believed that logic might prescribe laws about how people should think, logic is not the science of how people do think. Logical truths would remain true even if no one believed them nor used them in their reasoning. If humans were genetically designed to use regularly the so-called "inference rule" of affirming the consequent, etc., this would not make it logically valid. What is true or false, valid of invalid, does not depend on anyone's psychology or anyone's beliefs. To think otherwise is to confuse something's being true with something's being-taken-to-be-true.

3. Contributions to the Philosophy of Mathematics

Frege was an ardent proponent of logicism, the view that the truths of arithmetic are logical truths. Perhaps his most important contributions to the philosophy of mathematics were his arguments for this view. He also presented significant criticisms against rival views. We have seen that Frege was a harsh critic of psychologism in logic. He thought similarly about psychologism in mathematics. Numbers cannot be equated with anyone's mental images, nor truths of mathematics with psychological truths. Mathematical truths are objective, not subjective. Frege was also a critic of Mill's view that arithmetical truths are empirical truths, based on observation. Frege pointed out that it is not just observable things that can be counted, and that mathematical truths seem to apply also to these things. On Mill's view, numbers must be taken to be conglomerations of objects. Frege rejects this view for a number of reasons. Firstly, is one conglomeration of two things the same as a different conglomeration of two things, and if not, in what sense are they equal? Secondly, a conglomeration can be seen as made up of a different number of things, depending on how the parts are counted. One deck of cards contains fifty two cards, but each card consists of a multitude of atoms. There is no one uniquely determined "number" of the whole conglomeration. He also reiterated the arguments of others: that mathematical truths seem apodictic and knowable a priori. He also argued against the Kantian view that arithmetic truths are based on the pure intuition of the succession of time. His main argument against this view, however, was simply his own work in which he showed that truths about the nature of succession and sequence can be proven purely from the axioms of logic.

Frege was also an opponent of formalism, the view that arithmetic can be understood as the study of uninterpreted formal systems. While Frege's logical language represented a kind of formal system, he insisted that his formal system was important only because of what its signs represent and its propositions mean. The signs themselves, independently of what they mean, are unimportant. To suggest that mathematics is the study simply of the formal system, is, in Frege's eyes, to confuse the sign and thing signified. To suggest that arithmetic is the study of formal systems also suggests, absurdly, that the formula "5 + 7 = 12", written in Arabic numerals, is not the same truth as the formula, "V + VII = XII", written in Roman numerals. Frege suggests also that this confusion would have the absurd result that numbers simply are the numerals, the signs on the page, and that we should be able to study their properties with a microscope.

Frege suggests that rival views are often the result of attempting to understand the meaning of number terms in the wrong way, for example, in attempting to understand their meaning independently of the contexts in which they appear in sentences. If we are simply asked to consider what "two" means independently of the context of a sentence, we are likely to simply imagine the numeral "2", or perhaps some conglomeration of two things. Thus, in the Grundlagen, Frege espouses his famous context principle, to "never ask for the meaning of a word in isolation, but only in the context of a proposition." The Grundlagen is an earlier work, written before Frege had made the distinction between sense and reference (see below). It is an active matter of debate and discussion to what extent and how this principle coheres with Frege's later theory of meaning, but what is clear is that it plays an important role in his own philosophy of mathematics as described in the Grundlagen.

According to Frege, if we look at the contexts in which number words usually occur in a proposition, they appear as part of a sentence about a concept, specifically, as part of an expression that tells us how many times a certain concept is instantiated. Consider, for example, "I have six cards in my hand" or "There are 11 members of congress from Wisconsin." These propositions seem to tell us how many times the concepts of being a card in my hand and being a member of congress from Wisconsin are instantiated. Thus, Frege concludes that statements about numbers are statements about concepts. This insight was very important for Frege's case for logicism, as Frege was able to show that it is possible to define what it means for a concept to be instantiated a certain number of times purely logically by making use of quantifiers and identity. To say that the concept F is instantiated zero times is to say that there are no objects that instantiate F, or, equivalently, that everything does not instantiate F. To say that F is instantiated one time is to say there is an object x that instantiates F, and that for all objects y, either y does not instantiate F or y is x. To say that F is instantiated twice is to say that there are two objects, x and y, each of which instantiates F, but which are not the same as each other, and for all z, either z does not instantiate F, or z is x or z is y. One could then consider numbers as "second-level concepts", or concepts of concepts, which can be defined in purely logical terms. (For more on the distinction of levels of concepts, see above.)

Frege, however, does not leave his analysis of numbers there. Understanding number-claims as involving second-level concepts does give us some insight into the nature of numbers, but it cannot be left at this. Mathematics requires that numbers be treated as objects, and that we be able to provide a definition of the number "two" simpliciter, without having to speak of two Fs. For this purpose, Frege appeals to his theory of the value-ranges of concepts. On the notion of a value-range, see above. We saw above that we can gain some understanding of number claims as involving second-level concepts, or concepts of concepts. In order to find a definition of numbers as objects, Frege treats them instead as value-ranges of value-ranges. Exactly, however, are they to be understood?

Frege notes that we have an understanding of what it means to say that there are the same number of Fs as there are Gs. It is to say that there is a one-one mapping between the objects that instantiate F and the objects instantiating G, i.e. that there is some function f from entities that instantiate F onto entities that instantiate G such that there is a different F for every G, and a different G for every F, with none left over. (In this, Frege's views on the nature of cardinality were in part anticipated by Georg Cantor.) However, we must bear in mind that the propositions:

(1) There are equally many Fs as there are Gs.
(2) The number of Fs = the number of Gs

must obviously have the same truth-value, as they seem to express the same fact. We must, therefore, look for a way of understanding the phrase "the number of Fs" that occurs in (2) that makes clear how and why the whole proposition will be true or false for the same reason as (1) is true or false. Frege's suggestion is that "the number of Fs" means the same as "the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F." This means that the number of Fs is a certain value-range, containing value-ranges, and in particular, all those value-ranges that have as many members as there are Fs. Then (2) is understood as saying the same as "the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F = the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as G", which will be true if and only if there are equally many Fs as Gs, i.e. if every value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F is also a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as G.

To give some examples, if there are zero Fs, then the number of Fs, i.e. zero, is the value-range consisting of all value-ranges with no members. Recall that for Frege, classes are identified with value-ranges of concepts. (See above.) To rephrase the same point in terms of classes, zero is the class of all classes with no members. Since there is only one such class, zero is the class containing only the empty class. If there is one F, then the number of Fs, i.e. one, is the class consisting of all classes with one member (the extensions of concepts instantiated once). Here we can see the connection with the understanding of number expressions as being statements about concepts. Rather than understanding zero as the concept a concept has just in case it is not instantiated, zero is understood as the value-range consisting of value-ranges of concepts that are not instantiated. Rather than understanding one as the concept a concept has just in case it is instantiated by a unique object, it is understood as the value-range consisting of value-ranges of concepts instantiated by unique objects. This allows us to understand numbers as abstract objects, and provide a clear definition of the meaning of number signs in arithmetic such as "1", "2", "3", etc.

Some of Frege's most brilliant work came in providing definitions of the natural numbers in his logical language, and in proving some of their properties therein. After laying out the basic laws of logic, and defining axioms governing the truth-functions and value-ranges, etc., Frege begins by defining a relation that holds between two value-ranges just in case they are the value-ranges of concepts instantiated equally many times. This relation holds between value-ranges just in case they are the same size, i.e. just in case there is one-one correspondence between the entities that fall under their concepts. Using this, he then defines a function that takes a value-range as argument and yields as value the value-range consisting of all value-ranges the same size as it. The number zero is then defined as the value-range consisting of all value-ranges the same size as the value-range of the concept being non-self-identical. Since this concept is not instantiated, zero is defined as the value-range of all value-ranges with no members, as described above. There is only one such number zero. Since this is true, then the concept of being identical to zero is instantiated once. Frege then uses this to define one. One is defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept being identical to zero. Having defined one is this way, Frege is able to define two. He has already defined one and zero; they are each unique, but different from each other. Therefore, two can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept being identical to zero or identical to one. Frege is able to define all natural numbers in this way, and indeed, prove that there are infinitely many of them. Each natural number can be defined in terms of the previous one: for each natural number n, its successor (n + 1) can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept of being identical to one of the numbers between zero and n.

In the Begriffsschrift, Frege had already been able to prove certain results regarding series and sequences, and was able to define the ancestral of a relation. To understand the ancestral of a relation, consider the example of the relation of being the child of. A person x bears this relation to y just in case x is y's child. However, x falls in the ancestral of this relation with respect to y just in case x is the child of y, or is the child of y's child, or is the child of y's child's child, etc. Frege was able to define the ancestral of relations logically even in his early work. He put this to use in the Grundgesetze to define the natural numbers. We have seen how the notion of successorship can be defined for Frege, i.e. the relation n + 1 bears to n. The natural numbers can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges that fall under the ancestral of the successor relation with respect to zero. The natural numbers then consist of zero, the successor of zero (one), the successor of the successor of zero (two), and so on ad infinitum. Frege was then able to use this definition of the natural numbers to provide a logical analysis of mathematical induction, and prove that mathematical induction can be used validly to demonstrate the properties of the natural numbers, an extremely important result for making good on his logicist ambitions. Frege could then use mathematical induction to prove some of the basic laws of the natural numbers. Frege next turned his logicist method to an analysis of integers (including negative numbers) and then to the real numbers, defining them using the natural numbers and certain relations holding between them. We need not dwell on the details of this work here.

Frege's approach to providing a logical analysis of cardinality, the natural numbers, infinity and mathematical induction were groundbreaking, and have had a lasting importance within mathematical logic. Indeed, prior to 1902, it must have seemed to him that he had been completely successful in showing that the basic laws of arithmetic could be understood purely as logical truths. However, as we have seen, Frege's definition of numbers heavily involves the notion of classes or value-ranges, but his logical treatment of them is shown to be impossible due to Russell's paradox. This presents a serious problem for Frege's logicist approach. Another heavy blow came after Frege's death. In 1931, Kurt Gödel discovered his famous incompleteness proof to the effect that there can be no consistent formal system with a finite number of axioms in which it is possible to derive all of the truths of arithmetic. This presents a serious blow to more ambitious forms of logicism, such as Frege's, which aimed to provide precisely the sort of system Gödel showed impossible. Nevertheless, it cannot be denied that Frege's work in the philosophy of mathematics was important and insightful.

4. The Theory of Sense and Reference

Frege's influential theory of meaning, the theory of sense (Sinn) and reference (Bedeutung) was first outlined, albeit briefly, in his article, "Funktion und Begriff" of 1891, and was expanded and explained in greater detail in perhaps his most famous work, "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" of 1892. In "Funktion und Begriff", the distinction between the sense and reference of signs in language is first made in regard to mathematical equations. During Frege's time, there was a widespread dispute among mathematicians as to how the sign, "=", should be understood. If we consider an equation such as, "4 x 2 = 11 - 3", a number of Frege's contemporaries, for a variety of reasons, were wary of viewing this as an expression of an identity, or, in this case, as the claim that 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 are one and the same thing. Instead, they posited some weaker form of "equality" such that the numbers 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 would be said to be equal in number or equal in magnitude without thereby constituting one and the same thing. In opposition to the view that "=" signifies identity, such thinkers would point out that 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 cannot in all ways be thought to be the same. The former is a product, the latter a difference, etc.

In his mature period, however, Frege was an ardent opponent of this view, and argued in favor of understanding "=" as identity proper, accusing rival views of confusing form and content. He argues instead that expressions such as "4 x 2" and "11 - 3" can be understood as standing for one and the same thing, the number eight, but that this single entity is determined or presented differently by the two expressions. Thus, he makes a distinction between the actual number a mathematical expression such as "4 x 2" stands for, and the way in which that number is determined or picked out. The former he called the reference (Bedeutung) of the expression, and the latter was called the sense (Sinn) of the expression. In Fregean terminology, an expression is said to express its sense, and denote or refer to its reference.

The distinction between reference and sense was expanded, primarily in "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" as holding not only for mathematical expressions, but for all linguistic expressions (whether the language in question is natural language or a formal language). One of his primary examples therein involves the expressions "the morning star" and "the evening star". Both of these expressions refer to the planet Venus, yet they obviously denote Venus in virtue of different properties that it has. Thus, Frege claims that these two expressions have the same reference but different senses. The reference of an expression is the actual thing corresponding to it, in the case of "the morning star", the reference is the planet Venus itself. The sense of an expression, however, is the "mode of presentation" or cognitive content associated with the expression in virtue of which the reference is picked out.

Frege puts the distinction to work in solving a puzzle concerning identity claims. If we consider the two claims:

(1) the morning star = the morning star

(2) the morning star = the evening star

The first appears to be a trivial case of the law of self-identity, knowable a priori, while the second seems to be something that was discovered a posteriori by astronomers. However, if "the morning star" means the same thing as "the evening star", then the two statements themselves would also seem to have the same meaning, both involving a thing's relation of identity to itself. However, it then becomes to difficult to explain why (2) seems informative while (1) does not. Frege's response to this puzzle, given the distinction between sense and reference, should be apparent. Because the reference of "the evening star" and "the morning star" is the same, both statements are true in virtue of the same object's relation of identity to itself. However, because the senses of these expressions are different--in (1) the object is presented the same way twice, and in (2) it is presented in two different ways--it is informative to learn of (2). While the truth of an identity statement involves only the references of the component expressions, the informativity of such statements involves additionally the way in which those references are determined, i.e. the senses of the component expressions.

So far we have only considered the distinction as it applies to expressions that name some object (including abstract objects, such as numbers). For Frege, the distinction applies also to other sorts of expressions and even whole sentences or propositions. If the sense/reference distinction can be applied to whole propositions, it stands to reason that the reference of the whole proposition depends on the references of the parts and the sense of the proposition depends of the senses of the parts. (At some points, Frege even suggests that the sense of a whole proposition is composed of the senses of the component expressions.) In the example considered in the previous paragraph, it was seen that the truth-value of the identity claim depends on the references of the component expressions, while the informativity of what was understood by the identity claim depends on the senses. For this and other reasons, Frege concluded that the reference of an entire proposition is its truth-value, either the True or the False. The sense of a complete proposition is what it is we understand when we understand a proposition, which Frege calls "a thought" (Gedanke). Just as the sense of a name of an object determines how that object is presented, the sense of a proposition determines a method of determination for a truth-value. The propositions, "2 + 4 = 6" and "the Earth rotates", both have the True as their references, though this is in virtue of very different conditions holding in the two cases, just as "the morning star" and "the evening star" refer to Venus in virtue of different properties.

In "Über Sinn und Bedeutung", Frege limits his discussion of the sense/reference distinction to "complete expressions" such as names purporting to pick out some object and whole propositions. However, in other works, Frege makes it quite clear that the distinction can also be applied to "incomplete expressions", which include functional expressions and grammatical predicates. These expressions are incomplete in the sense that they contain an "empty space", which, when filled, yields either a complex name referring to an object, or a complete proposition. Thus, the incomplete expression "the square root of ( )" contains a blank spot, which, when completed by an expression referring to a number, yields a complex expression also referring to a number, e.g., "the square root of sixteen". The incomplete expression, "( ) is a planet" contains an empty place, which, when filled with a name, yields a complete proposition. According to Frege, the references of these incomplete expressions are not objects but functions. Objects (Gegenstände), in Frege's terminology, are self-standing, complete entities, while functions are essentially incomplete, or as Frege says, "unsaturated" (ungesättigt) in that they must take something else as argument in order to yield a value. The reference of the expression "square root of ( )" is thus a function, which takes numbers as arguments and yields numbers as values. The situation may appear somewhat different in the case of grammatical predicates. However, because Frege holds that complete propositions, like names, have objects as their references, and in particular, the truth-values the True or the False, he is able to treat predicates also as having functions as their references. In particular, they are functions mapping objects onto truth-values. The expression, "( ) is a planet" has as its reference a function that yields as value the True when saturated by an object such as Saturn or Venus, but the False when saturated by a person or the number three. Frege calls such a function of one argument place that yields the True or False for every possible argument a "concept" (Begriff), and calls similar functions of more than one argument place (such as that denoted by "( ) > ( )", which is doubly in need of saturation), "relations".

It is clear that functions are to be understood as the references of incomplete expressions, but what of the senses of such expressions? Here, Frege tells us relatively little save that they exist. There is some amount of controversy among interpreters of Frege as to how they should be understood. It suffices here to note that just as the same object (e.g. the planet Venus), can be presented in different ways, so also can a function be presented in different ways. While "identity", as Frege uses the term, is a relation holding only between objects, Frege believes that there is a relation similar to identity that holds between functions just in case they always share the same value for every argument. Since all and only those things that have hearts have kidneys, strictly speaking, the concepts denoted by the expressions "( ) has a heart", and "( ) has a kidney" are one and the same. Clearly, however, these expressions do not present that concept in the same way. For Frege, these expressions would have different senses but the same reference. Frege also tells us that it is the incomplete nature of these senses that provides the "glue" holding together the thoughts of which they form a part.

Frege also uses the distinction to solve what appears to be a difficulty with Leibniz's law with regard to identity. This law was stated by Leibniz as, "those things are the same of which one can be substituted for another without loss of truth," a sentiment with which Frege was in full agreement. As Frege understands this, it means that if two expressions have the same reference, they should be able to replace each other within any proposition without changing the truth-value of that proposition. Normally, this poses no problem. The inference from:

(3) The morning star is a planet.

to the conclusion:

(4) The evening star is a planet.

in virtue of (2) above and Leibniz's law is unproblematically valid. However, there seem to be some serious counterexamples to this principle. We know for example that "the morning star" and "the evening star" have the same customary reference. However, it is not always true that they can replace one another without changing the truth of a sentence. For example, if we consider the propositions:

(5) Gottlob believes that the morning star is a planet.

(6) Gottlob believes that the evening star is a planet.

If we assume that Gottlob does not know that the morning star is the same heavenly body as the evening star, (5) may be true while (6) false or vice versa.

Frege meets this challenge to Leibniz's law by making a distinction between what he calls the primary and secondary references of expressions. Frege suggests that when expressions appear in certain unusual contexts, they have as their references what is customarily their senses. In such cases, the expressions are said to have their secondary references. Typically, such cases involve what Frege calls "indirect speech" or "oratio obliqua", as in the case of statements of beliefs, thoughts, desires and other so-called "propositional attitudes", such as the examples of (5) and (6). However, expressions also have their secondary references (for reasons which should already be apparent) in contexts such as "it is informative that..." or "... is analytically true".

Let us consider the examples of (5) and (6) more closely. To Frege's mind, these statements do not deal directly with the morning star and the evening star itself. Rather, they involve a relation between a believer and a thought believed. Thoughts, as we have seen, are the senses of complete propositions. Beliefs depend for their make-up on how certain objects and concepts are presented, not only on the objects and concepts themselves. The truth of belief claims, therefore, will depend not on the customary references of the component expressions of the stated belief, but their senses. Since the truth-value of the whole belief claim is the reference of that belief claim, and the reference of any proposition, for Frege, depends on the references of its component expressions, we are lead to the conclusion that the typical senses of expressions that appear in oratio obliqua are in fact the references of those expressions when they appear in that context. Such contexts can be referred to as "oblique contexts", contexts in which the reference of an expression is shifted from its customary reference to its customary sense.

In this way, Frege is able to actually retain his commitment in Leibniz's law. The expressions "the morning star" and "the evening star" have the same primary reference, and in any non-oblique context, they can replace each other without changing the truth-value of the proposition. However, since the senses of these expressions are not the same, they cannot replace each other in oblique contexts, because in such contexts, their references are non-identical.

Frege ascribes to senses and thoughts objective existence. In his mind, they are objects every bit as real as tables and chairs. Their existence is not dependent on language or the mind. Instead, they are said to exist in a timeless "third realm" of sense, existing apart from both the mental and the physical. Frege concludes this because, although senses are obviously not physical entities, their existence likewise does not depend on any one person's psychology. A thought, for example, has a truth-value regardless of whether or not anyone believes it and even whether or not anyone has grasped it at all. Moreover, senses are interpersonal. Different people are able to grasp the same senses and same thoughts and communicate them, and it is even possible for expressions in different languages to express the same sense or thought. Frege concludes that they are abstract objects, incapable of full causal interaction with the physical world. They are actual only in the very limited sense that they can have an effect on those who grasp them, but are themselves incapable of being changed or acted upon. They are neither created by our uses of language or acts of thinking, nor destroyed by their cessation.

Unfortunately, Frege does not tell us very much about exactly how these abstract objects pick out or present their references. Exactly what is it that makes a sense a "way of determining" or "mode of presenting" a reference? In the wake of Russell's theory of descriptions, a Fregean sense is often interpreted as a set of descriptive information or criteria that picks out its reference in virtue of the reference alone satisfying or fitting that descriptive information. In giving examples, Frege implies that a person might attach to the name "Aristotle" the sense the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great. This sense picks out Aristotle the person because he alone matches this description. Here, care must be taken to avoid misunderstanding. The sense of the name "Aristotle" is not the words "the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great"; to repeat, senses are not linguistic items. It is rather that the sense consists in some set of descriptive information, and this information is best described by a descriptive phrase of this form. The property of being the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander is unique to Aristotle, and thus, it may be in virtue of associating this information with the name "Aristotle" that this name may be used to refer to Aristotle. As certain commentators have noted, it is not even necessary that the sense of the name be expressible by some descriptive phrase, because the descriptive information or properties in virtue of which the reference is determined may not be directly nameable in any natural language.

From this standpoint, it is easy to understand how there might be senses that do not pick out any reference. Names such as "Romulus" or "Odysseus", and phrases such as "the least rapidly converging series" or "the present King of France" express senses, insofar as they lay out criteria that things would have to satisfy if they were to be the references of these expressions. However, there are no things which do in fact satisfy these criteria. Therefore, these expressions are meaningful, but do not have references. Because the sense of a whole proposition is determined by the senses of the parts, and the reference of a whole proposition is determined by the parts, Frege claims that propositions in which such expressions appear are able to express thoughts, but are neither true nor false, because no references are determined for them.

This interpretation of the nature of senses makes Frege a forerunner to what has since been come to be known as the "descriptivist" theory of meaning and reference in the philosophy of language. The view that the sense of a proper name such as "Aristotle" could be descriptive information as simple as the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great, however, has been harshly criticized by many philosophers, and perhaps most notably by Saul Kripke. Kripke points out that this would make a claim such as "Aristotle taught Alexander" seem to be a necessary and analytic truth, which it does not appear to be. Moreover, he claims that many of us seem to be able to use a name to refer to an individual even if we are unaware of any properties uniquely held by that individual. For example, many of us don't know enough about the physicist Richard Feynman to be able to identify a property differentiating him from other prominent physicists such as Murray Gell-Mann, but we still seem to be able to refer to Feynman with the name "Feynman". John Searle, Michael Dummett and others, however, have proposed ways of expanding or altering Frege's notion of a sense to circumvent Kripke's worries. This has lead to a very important debate in the philosophy of language, which, unfortunately, we cannot fully discuss here.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Frege's Own Works

  • "Antwort auf die Ferienplauderei des Herrn Thomae." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 15 (1906): 586-90. Translated as "Reply to Thomae's Holiday Causerie." In Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic and Philosophy [CP], 341-5. Translated by M. Black, V. Dudman, P. Geach, H. Kaal, E.-H. W. Kluge, B. McGuinness and R. H. Stoothoff. New York: Basil Blackwell, 1984.
  • "Über Begriff und Gegenstand." Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 16 (1892): 192-205. Translated as "On Concept and Object." In >CP 182-94. Also in The Frege Reader [FR], 181-93. Edited by Michael Beaney. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997. And In Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege [TPW], 42-55. 3d ed. Edited by Peter Geach and Max Black. Oxford: Blackwell, 1980.
  • Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens. Halle: L. Nebert, 1879. Translated as Begriffsschrift, a Formula Language, Modeled upon that of Arithmetic, for Pure Thought. In From Frege to Gödel, edited by Jean van Heijenoort. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967. Also as Conceptual Notation and Related Articles. Edited and translated by Terrell W. Bynum. London: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • "Über die Begriffsschrift des Herrn Peano und meine eigene." Verhandlungen der Königlich Sächsischen Gesellschaft der Wissenschaften zu Leipzig 48 (1897): 362-8. Translated as "On Mr. Peano's Conceptual Notation and My Own." In CP 234-48.
  • "Über formale Theorien der Arithmetik." Sitzungsberichte der Jenaischen Gesellschaft für Medizin und Naturwissenschaft 19 (1885): 94-104. Translated as "On Formal Theories of Arithmetic." In CP 112-21.
  • Funktion und Begriff. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1891. Translated as "Function and Concept." In CP 137-56, TPW 21-41 and FR 130-48.
  • "Der Gedanke." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 58-77. Translated as "Thoughts." In CP 351-72. Also as part I of Logical Investigations [LI], edited by P. T. Geach. Oxford: Blackwell, 1977. And as "Thought." In FR 325-45.
  • "Gedankengefüge." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 3 (1923): 36-51. Translated as "Compound Thoughts." In CP 390-406, and as part III of LI.
  • Über eine geometrische Darstellung der imaginären Gebilde in der Ebene. Ph. D. Dissertation: University of Göttingen, 1873. Translated as "On a Geometrical Representation of Imaginary Forms in the Plane." In CP 1-55.
  • Grundgesetze der Arithmetik. 2 vols. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1893-1903. Translated in part as The Basic Laws of Arithmetic: Exposition of the System. Edited and translated by Montgomery Furth. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964.
  • "Über die Grundlagen der Geometrie." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 12 (1903): 319-24, 368-75, 15 (1906): 293-309, 377-403, 423-30. Translated as "On the Foundations of Geometry." In CP 273-340. Also as On the Foundations of Geometry and Formal Theories of Arithmetic. Translated by Eike-Henner W. Kluge. New York: Yale University Press, 1971.
  • Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl. Breslau: W. Koebner, 1884. Translated as The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number. 2d ed. Translated by J. L. Austin. Oxford: Blackwell, 1953.
  • "Kritische Beleuchtung einiger Punkte in E. Schröders Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik." Archiv für systematsche Philosophie 1 (1895): 433-56. Translated as "A Critical Elucidation of Some Points in E. Schröder, Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik." In CP 210-28, and TPW 86-106.
  • Nachgelassene Schriften. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1969. Translated as Posthumous Writings. Translated by Peter Long and Roger White. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1979.
  • "Le nombre entier." Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 3 (1895): 73-8. Translated as "Whole Numbers." In CP 229-33.
  • Rechnungsmethoden, die auf eine Erweiterung des Grössenbegriffes gründen. Habilitationsschrift: University of Jena, 1874. Translated as "Methods of Calculation based on an Extension of the Concept of Quantity." In CP 56-92.
  • Review of Zur Lehre vom Transfiniten, by Georg Cantor. Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100 (1892): 269-72. Translated in CP 178-181.
  • Review of Philosophie der Arithmetik, by Edmund Husserl. Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 103 (1894): 313-32. Translated in CP 195-209.
  • "Über Sinn und Bedeutung." Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100 (1892): 25-50. Translated as "On Sense and Meaning." In CP 157-77. As "On Sinn and Bedeutung." In FR 151-71. And as "On Sense and Reference." In TPW 56-78.
  • "Über das Trägheitsgesetz." Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 98 (1891): 145-61. Translated as "On the Law of Inertia." In CP 123-36.
  • "Die Unmöglichkeit der Thomaeschen formalen Arithmetik aus Neue nachgewiesen." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 17 (1908): 52-5. Translated as "Renewed Proof of the Impossibility of Mr. Thomae's Formal Arithmetic." In CP 346-50.
  • "Der Verneinung." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 143-57. Translated as "Negation." In CP 373-89, part II of LI, and FR 346-61.
  • "Was ist ein Funktion?" In Festschrift Ludwig Boltzmann gewidmet zum sechzigsten Geburtstage, 656-66. Leipzig: Amrosius Barth, 1904. Translated as "What is a Function?" In CP 285-92, and TPW 285-92.
  • Wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1976. Translated as Philosophical and Mathematical Correspondence. Translated by Hans Kaal. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980.
  • Über die Zahlen des Herrn H. Schubert. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1899. Translated as "On Mr. H. Schubert's Numbers." In CP 249-72.

b. Important Secondary Works

  • Angelelli, Ignacio. Studies on Gottlob Frege and Traditional Philosophy. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1967.
  • Baker, G. P. and P. M. S. Hacker. Frege: Logical Excavations. New York: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Beaney, Michael. Frege: Making Sense. London: Duckworth, 1996.
  • Beaney, Michael. Introduction to The Frege Reader, by Gottlob Frege. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997.
  • Bell, David. Frege's Theory of Judgment. New York: Oxford University Press, 1979.
  • Bynum, Terrell W. "On the Life and Work of Gottlob Frege. " Introduction to Conceptual Notation and Related Articles, by Gottlob Frege. London: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • Carl, Wolfgang. Frege's Theory of Sense and Reference. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Carnap, Rudolph. Meaning and Necessity. 2d ed. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1956.
  • Church, Alonzo. "A Formulation of the Logic of Sense and Denotation." In Structure, Method and Meaning: Essays in Honor of Henry M. Sheffer, edited by P. Henle, H. Kallen and S. Langer, 3- 24. New York: Liberal Arts Press, 1951.
  • Currie, Gregory. Frege: An Introduction to His Philosophy. Totowa, NJ: Barnes and Noble, 1982.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege: Philosophy of Language. 2d ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1991.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege and Other Philosophers. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
  • Dummett, Michael. The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
  • Geach, Peter T. "Frege." In Three Philosophers, edited by G. E. M. Anscombe and P. T. Geach, 127-62. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1961.
  • Gödel, Kurt. "On Formally Undecidable Propositions of Principia Mathematica and Related Systems I." In From Frege to Gödel, edited by Jan van Heijenoort, 596-616. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967. Originally published as "Über formal unentscheidbare Sätze der Principia Mathematica und verwandter Systeme I." Monatshefte für Mathematik und Physik 38 (1931): 173-98.
  • Grossmann, Reinhardt. Reflections on Frege's Philosophy. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1969.
  • Haaparanta, Leila and Jaakko Hintikka, eds. Frege Synthesized. Boston: D. Reidel, 1986.
  • Kaplan, David. "Quantifying In." Synthese 19 (1968): 178-214.
  • Klemke, E. D., ed. Essays on Frege. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1968.
  • Kluge, Eike-Henner W. The Metaphysics of Gottlob Frege. Boston: Martinus Nijhoff, Boston, 1980.
  • Kneale, William and Martha Kneale. The Development of Logic. London: Oxford University Press, 1962.
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Author Information

Kevin C. Klement
University of Massachusetts, Amherst
U. S. A.

Gottlob Frege: Language

FregeGottlob Frege (1848-1925) is most celebrated today for his contributions to mathematical logic and the philosophy of language. The first section below considers why a philosophical investigation of language mattered at all for Frege, the mathematician, and why it should have mattered to him.  At the same time, the considerations may serve to illustrate some general motivations that were behind the development of philosophy of language as a separate branch of philosophy in the 20th century. Section 2 deals with Frege's idea of a formal language and the motivations for developing and employing such a language for purposes of logico-philosophical analysis. The shift from Frege's early semantics to his famous distinction between sense and significance is explained in Section 3, as are the motivations for this shift. The section also contains a discussion of the difficulties that scholars have encountered when trying to find a proper English translation of Frege's key semantic terms. Michael Dummett's claim that Frege had brought the modern tradition to an end by replacing epistemology with the theory of meaning as the foundation of philosophy in general has been an influential interpretation, but has increasingly been challenged in the past decades.  The present article emphasizes that  Frege's philosophy of language should be regarded as a branch of epistemology, even if Frege himself did not fully engage in epistemology in the narrower sense of the term.

Table of Contents

  1. Language and Thought
    1. Communication
    2. Language and Memory
    3. Rationalism, Platonism, and Empiricism about Thoughts
  2. The Formal Language Approach
    1. The Concept Script
    2. The Logical Imperfections of Ordinary Language
      1. Non-Observance of the Difference Between Concept and Object
      2. Empty Proper Names
      3. The Vagueness of Predicates
      4. Grammatical versus Logical Categories
      5. The Intermingling of Subjective and Objective Aspects of Meaning
  3. From Conceptual Contents to Sinn and Bedeutung: The Development of Frege's Semantics
    1. The Monism of Frege's Early Semantics
    2. Sense and Significance
    3. Some Issues of Translation
    4. The Context Principle and the Priority of Judgments over Concepts
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Frege's Writings
    2. Other Recommended Literature
      1. General Introductions and Companions to Frege's Work
      2. General Introductions to the Philosophy of Language
      3. On (Various Aspects of) Frege’s Philosophy of Language
      4. Other Philosophy of Language Relevant to or Referenced in this Article
      5. Some Specialized Literature on the Epistemological Dimensions of Frege’s Thought
      6. General Contributions and Companions to the History of Early Analytic Philosophy
      7. Literature on Other Aspects of Frege’s Philosophy
      8. Other Literature Referenced in this Article
    3. Related Entries

1. Language and Thought

Long before Frege, it was considered commonplace that language is a necessary vehicle for human thought. In the modern period, Thomas Hobbes and John Locke had assigned two main characteristic uses to language with regard to thought: First, it is used to assist memory, or the representation and recording of one's own thoughts; and second, it is used as a required vehicle of communication of one's own thoughts to other people (Hobbes 1655:192-97; Locke 1690, Bk. III, §1). It was not before the later decades of the 19th century, however, that philosophical method was finally beginning to take a radically "linguistic turn" – investigating language in order to best deal with ontological or conceptual problems – and Frege has been regarded as one of the first and the most innovative thinkers in this respect.

For Frege, too, it was the very insight that human thought depends in certain ways on language, or on symbols in general, that compelled him to analyze the workings of language in order to investigate the logical structure of thought. Indeed, it seems that language itself was never the primary object of his philosophical interest. Rather, most of the general philosophical issues upon which Frege reflected, aside from his more specialized projects in the philosophy of mathematics, had to do with the nature of thought in general and its relation to logic, to truth, to language, and to the objects it can be about. In 1918, Frege published a lengthy essay titled "Thoughts," in which he describes his motives for investigating the nature of language:

I am not here in the happy position of a mineralogist who shows his audience a rock-crystal: I cannot put a thought in the hands of my readers with the request that they should examine it from all sides. Something in itself not perceptible by sense, the thought is presented to the reader – and I must be content with that – wrapped up in a perceptible linguistic form. The pictorial aspect of language presents difficulties. The sensible always breaks in and makes expressions pictorial and so improper. So one fights against language, and I am compelled to occupy myself with language although it is not my proper concern here. I hope I have succeeded in making clear to my readers what I want to call 'thought' (1997:333f., n.).

Frege presents us with a dilemma that lies at the heart of his lifelong attitude toward language. On the one hand, language is indispensable for us in order to get access to thought. On the other hand, language – because of its sensible character – obscures thought (which by itself is insensible). Thus, Frege saw himself forced to deal with language by way of a continuous struggle – fighting the distortions that are imposed on thought by language, and diagnosing as well as clarifying the misunderstandings that result from these distortions.

But why is language indispensable for thought, and why did Frege think that it is? These two questions are central for an understanding of the rise of philosophy of language in general, and of Frege's engagement in philosophy of language in particular. They are important because, if it turns out that we cannot find a convincing reason for the indispensability of language for thought, then the struggle with language that Frege is talking about above would not seem necessary for philosophical inquiry: we could just circumvent the obstacle of language and access our concepts and thoughts directly. Historically, dealing with the second question in particular might give us some insight about the extent of Frege's possible indebtedness, or lack thereof, to earlier conceptions of the relations between language and thought and language as such.

Thus, it would be worthwhile taking a closer look at the two traditional functions of language with regard to thought that Hobbes and Locke distinguished in the context of their respective epistemological reflections. These were: (a) the indispensable assistance of language to memory, or to the representation and recording of one's own thoughts, and (b) its role as a necessary vehicle of the communication of one's own thoughts to other people.

a. Communication

If we take a closer look at those two characteristic functions of language as traditionally distinguished we find that they seem to be intimately connected. For one thing, if we conceive of human communication as essentially intentional – as has been the standard view probably throughout the history of philosophy, and most prominently advocated in the 20th century by Paul Grice – then we must ask just how we could even intend to convey a certain piece of information to someone else if we are not able to represent this information to ourselves in conscious thought. Our communicative intention would be quite void – there would be a missing element in the three-place relation "X intends to convey Y to Z". Even less, it seems, could intentional communication ever succeed if the speaker is not herself aware of what she intends to communicate – unless, perhaps, we also acknowledge the existence of subconscious communicational intentions. But even in this case, it could be argued, the speaker presumably would need to be able to have a representation of what she subconsciously intends to convey in order to do so, and if such a representation is only to be had through language then even the kind of communication that rests on subconscious intentions could not take place without language.

To be sure, information may in principle be conveyed even without the conveyor's intention, and perhaps it is merely a matter of terminology whether or not we acknowledge that there is also something like unintentional human communication: slips of the tongue, a blushful face, or mere movements of a face muscle, can only too well convey information about the thoughts or attitudes of the conveyor, and even indirectly about what these thoughts and attitudes are about.  However, even if we include such phenomena in the category of "human communication", it still appears that language is required for communication precisely insofar as it is required for the representation and recording of one's own thoughts.  For, in such a case, the very act of understanding the piece of information conveyed requires the person to whom it is conveyed to be able to record it for herself in her own memory; and, inasmuch as this requires language, human communication always requires language at least on he side of the receiver of the information - even if communication is to be understood as not presupposing communicational intentions. On this account, language appears as a necessary vehicle of human communication precisely because it is a necessary vehicle to record one's own thoughts. Thus, communication of one's own thoughts to another appears to be entirely dependent on representing and recording one's own thoughts to herself.

b. Language and Memory

Why should language be a necessary vehicle to record one's own thoughts? And what does this exactly mean? Does it mean that language constitutes thought, so that the latter could not be without the former? Or does it merely mean that we could not become aware of our thoughts or could not grasp them without language?

Let us look at what Frege thought about this matter. His earliest and at the same time most comprehensive attempt to answer the first question above is in his 1882 piece "On the Scientific Justification of a Begriffsschrift". The relevant passages are cited at full length:

Our attention is directed by nature to the outside. The vivacity of sense-impressions surpasses that of memory-images to such an extent that, at first, sense-impressions determine almost by themselves the course of our ideas, as is the case in animals. And we would scarcely ever be able to escape this dependency if the outer world were not to some degree dependent on us.

Even most animals, through their ability to move about, have an influence on their sense-impressions: They can flee some, seek others. And they can even effect changes in things. Now humans have this ability to a much greater degree; but nevertheless, the course of our ideas would still not gain its full freedom from this ability alone: It would still be limited to that which our hand can fashion, our voice intone, without the great invention of symbols, which call to mind that which is absent, invisible, perhaps even beyond the senses.

I do not deny that even without symbols the perception of a thing can gather about itself a group of memory-images; but we could not pursue these further: A new perception would let these images sink into darkness and allow others to emerge. But if we produce the symbol of an idea that a perception has called to mind, we create in this way a firm, new focus about which ideas gather. We then select another idea from these in order to elicit its symbol. Thus we penetrate step by step into the inner world of our ideas and move about there at will, using the realm of sensibles itself to free ourselves from its constraint. Symbols have the same importance for thought that discovering how to use the wind to sail against the wind had for navigation....

Also, without symbols we would scarcely lift ourselves to conceptual thinking. Thus in applying the same symbol to different but similar things, we actually no longer symbolize the individual thing, but rather what the similarities have in common: the concept. This concept is first gained by symbolizing it; for since it is, in itself, imperceptible, it requires a perceptible representative in order to appear to  us" (1972:83f. Note, Frege's expression "men" has been changed to "humans").

Frege appears to locate the source of the dependence of human thought on language in the power that sensation exerts on our attention. Based on this he specifies three main characteristic domains of thought for which we need symbols. First, without symbols we could not become aware of things that are physically absent or insensible. Without them we could only become aware of our immediate sensations and some fleeting memory images of these sensations. This view, however – that we could not grasp or become aware of thoughts about invisible things – does not by itself imply that the thoughts themselves could not be without language.

The second domain concerns memory in general. Though according to Frege, the mere perception of a physical object can serve as a focus around which memory images gather even without the help of symbols, these would not be stable and lasting, for new perceptual images would soon take their place. Immediate sensations are usually so much stronger than memory images that without the help of a tool by means of which we could regulate the train and content of our thought independently of sensation it would be almost entirely determined by immediate sensory input. Thus, what Frege seems to have in mind here is that only by using symbols do we enable ourselves to memorize ideas in such a way that we can henceforth call them up more or less at will. In this way, symbols – though themselves sensible – are able, to a large extent, to free us from our dependence on the sensible world. Again, this argument leads only to the conclusion that we could not freely call up past thoughts about the world – it does not show that these thoughts could not exist in the first place without language.

In any case, why should the memory of symbols be less subject to the overwhelming influence of immediate sensations than the fleeting memory images caused by perception without the help of symbols? Perhaps a later passage in the same paper gives us a clue about how it seemed possible to Frege that due to its very nature language could give us power over the immediate impact of sensation and thus enable us to memorize our thoughts:

It is impossible, someone might say, to advance science with a conceptual notation, for the invention of the latter already presupposes the completion of the former. Exactly the same apparent difficulty arises for [ordinary] language. This is supposed to have made reason possible, but how could humans have invented language without reason? Research into the laws of nature employs physical instruments; but these can be produced only by means of an advanced technology, which again is based upon knowledge of the laws of nature. The circle is resolved in each case in the same way: An advance in physics results in an advance in technology, and this makes possible the construction of new instruments by means of which physics is advanced. The application to our case is obvious (1972:89).

Here, Frege draws an analogy between language and reason on the one hand, and technology and science on the other. In both cases, each of the two elements in the respective pairs is needed in order to advance the other. Thus, language is needed to develop and/or employ our faculty of reasoning, on the one hand, but at the same time reason has to be presupposed to a certain degree in order for language to be possible. Hence, for Frege there is something which is the condition of possibility of language, even though that something –which he calls reason – may not fully function or be applicable without language as its tool. This suggests that for Frege reason is also what enables us to overcome the power of immediate sensual input by using language as a tool; it enables us to memorize links between symbols and what they symbolize even despite the continuous influx of fleeting sensations and memory images. In effect, Frege appears to propose a non-vicious circle between reason and language such that, roughly, the former enables us – by its very nature – to hold in memory a small initial assortment of symbols, and such that the use of these symbols then expands our rational capacities to allow for the combinations and application of those symbols, which in turn are stored in the memory to lead to further combinations – as well as the possible invention of new symbols or symbolic systems – whose use leads to further mental expansion, etc. This conception seems to rule out that language could be the product of mere sensation, at least if sensation is not to be conceived of as part of reason or as its basis.

Frege's third explanation for why we need language in order to think is that without the help of symbols we could never raise ourselves to the level of specifically conceptual thinking. For, according to Frege in the passage above, we acquire concepts only by applying the same symbol to different but similar things, thereby no longer symbolizing the individual things, but rather what they have in common: the concept.  Again, this argument does not show that concepts could not exist without language or symbols; rather, it shows that concepts could not become available to us without language. In Frege's own terms, it shows that we could not represent to ourselves what a group of similar things have in common, which is what he calls a concept.

c. Rationalism, Platonism, and Empiricism about Thoughts

Scholars point out that aspects of Frege's 1882 explanation of why we need language in order to think suggest an empiricist, psychologist account (at least of thought content) according to which thought content derives simply from sense impressions via memory images; however, this stands in contrast at least to Frege's later views on the matter (for example, Sluga 2002:82). Indeed, Frege's above admission that at the most basic level sense perception and memory are possible without prior possession of non-sensual conceptual elements seems to stand in direct contrast to rationalist as well as Kantian accounts of the nature of perception. Though, as we saw in the previous section, none of Frege's arguments for the dependency of thought on language explicitly commit him to the view that the very existence of concepts or thought contents depend on language, the idea that at least basic thoughts and memories are possible on the basis of sensation alone raises the question of why then not all thought and memory content may derive – by means of language – from sensual images (which clearly would be an empiricist view).

If this assessment of Frege's 1882 view of content is correct, then it might also be relevant to our evaluation of the above argument as an attempt at explaining why language is necessary for thought. For if, by contrast, we assume that the human mind is furnished with innate ideas in addition to the faculty of sensation – as had been the standard view in modern Continental Rationalism – then it might need some more argumentation to show why concepts become available to us only through the application of general symbols to things that we perceive through the senses, or why we could think of invisible, insensible things only by creating symbols for them. After all, innate ideas – if they exist – are in a certain sense continually present in the mind, if not in our consciousness, and this very presence could perhaps already explain why we are able to memorize perceptual experiences, to engage in conceptual thinking, and in general to overcome the continuous impact of sensation on our attention. In other words, if our minds were already furnished with innate ideas then it would need further explanation to understand why reason could not have a direct impact on human consciousness, that is, why it needs language in addition in order to guide and develop our capacity of thinking. If we assume, however, that thought contents are by their very nature entirely made up of sensations and images gained through sensation, then it would seem much more obvious that without the acquisition of general symbols to represent concepts – instead of the individual, elusive images delivered by sensation – there would be no way for us to make use of and memorize them.

Thus, if Frege held a rationalist view of thought contents at this early point, his argument above for the indispensability of thought for language would still appear somewhat incomplete, and if he was an empiricist about thought content at the time but changed his view later, he should have been expected to supplement his argument at that later time in order to convince us of the necessity to study language in order to explore concepts and thoughts. So let us take a closer look both at Frege's views of the nature of thought content and at plausible rationalist motivations for the philosophical study of language based on the idea that language is necessary for human thought.

Let us first get back to Frege's apparent view – in his 1882 piece – that basic forms of sense perception and memory are possible without prior possession of non-sensual thought contents. This view appears to contradict his own later remarks on perception in, for instance, 1918's "Thought". There he emphasizes that:

Sense impressions alone do not reveal the external world to us. Perhaps there is a being that has only sense impressions without seeing or touching things....Having visual impressions is certainly necessary for seeing things, but not sufficient. What must still be added is not anything sensible. And yet this is just what opens up the external world for us; for without this non-sensible something everyone would remain shut up in his inner world. So perhaps, since the decisive factor lies in the non-sensible, something non-sensible, even without the cooperation of sense impressions, could also lead us out of the inner world and enable us to grasp thoughts (1997: 342f.).

For Frege, forming a thought about the external world -- even the kind of thought involved in the mere perception of an object -- requires more than sense impressions that are available to the human mind. In addition, something non-sensible has to be assumed in order to account for the possibility of perception. The aim of "Thought" was to show that this something is the thought itself -- an entity that, as Frege argues here, belongs neither to the inner world of subjective ideas nor to the world of spatio-temporal, perceivable objects, but rather to a third realm of objective but non-physical things. Indeed, as we read in an earlier passage of the piece, "although the thought does not belong with the contents of the thinker's consciousness, there must be something in his consciousness that is aimed at the thought. But this should not be confused with the thought itself" (ibid.: 342).  In this last passage, Frege clearly distinguishes between a conscious act of thinking – which must be in a certain way "aimed at" an abstract, objective thought – and the thought itself at which it is aimed.

In addition, Frege explicitly rejects the idea that sense impressions alone could enable our minds to grasp such an objective, non-sensible thought -- rather, what is required is again something "non-sensible." This idea obviously fits in with what he said in his 1882 piece about the relation between language and reason. For according to that remark, language – as a means for grasping thoughts – presupposes reason at least as an independent potential. Reason, then, is a likely candidate for the "something non-sensible" that may be required, according to Frege in 1918, "to lead us out of the inner world and enable us to grasp thoughts."  Since language itself consists of and works through the perception and use of sensible symbols, it could not be language that Frege has in mind here. However, Frege does not make use of the term "reason" in his 1918 piece but speaks more concretely of a "special mental capacity, the power of thinking", which is supposed to explain our ability to grasp a thought (ibid.: 341).

In any case, these remarks provide clear evidence that Frege in 1918 conceived of thoughts as existing independently of both physical and empirically psychological reality – thereby ruling out an empiricist account of their constitution. They do not provide conclusive evidence that Frege endorsed a rationalist or transcendentalist view of the origin or nature of conceptual entities, if by this we understand a view according to which either a special faculty of reason – or pure understanding – or alternatively a certain normative value or principle that is constitutive of rationality in general serve to provide the conceptual content of our thought episodes. Rather, Frege's 1918 remarks would just as well be compatible with a naive Platonist view about thought contents, according to which their objective existence is a brute fact, that is, not accountable or explainable in terms of anything else. (This still seems to be one of the most dominant readings of the nature of Fregean thoughts, as well as concepts and numbers; see Baker and Hacker 1984, Dummett 1991, Burge 1992, & al.)

It seems obvious, however, that Frege favored a broadly rationalist or transcendentalist account of the origin of conceptual entities both in his first monograph Conceptual Notation (1879) and in his second, The Foundations of Arithmetic (1884). For in §23 of Conceptual Notation, Frege claims to have shown "how pure thought, regardless of any content given through the senses or even given a priori through an intuition, is able, all by itself, to produce from the content which arises from its own nature judgments that at first glance seem to be possible only on the grounds of some intuition." What Frege has in mind here by "the content that arises from its [pure thought's] own nature" obviously is the content of the laws of logic, which he also calls the "laws of thought" in his preface to Conceptual Notation. Those judgments, by contrast, which "at first glance seem to be possible only on the grounds of some intuition" presumably are those of arithmetic, which Kant had believed to be grounded on the pure intuition of time. This 1879 metaphor of pure thought as grounding arithmetical judgments by way of "the content that arises from its own nature" not only appears inconsistent with Frege's 1882 seeming slip into psychologism about mental content, but at the same time suggests a rationalist or transcendental approach to the nature of at least some of the contents of our judgments. This is so if we conceive of "pure thought" as referring to a capacity or principle that is constitutive of the rational mind, which is how this expression, and similar ones, had been used by Leibniz, Kant, and their successors.

Indeed, in Foundations Frege explicitly sympathizes with Leibniz's view that "the whole of arithmetic is innate and is in virtual fashion in us;" a view according to which even what is innate may need to be learned in order for us to become consciously aware of it (1953, §11). In other passages of Foundations, Frege presents objectivity itself as being constituted by reason, and numbers as its nearest kin:

I understand objective to mean what is independent of our sensations, intuition and imagination, and of all construction of mental pictures out of memories of earlier sensations, but not what is independent of the reason, - for what are things independent of the reason? To answer that would be as much as to judge without judging, or to wash the fur without wetting it (1953, §26).

[O]bjectivity cannot, of course be based on any sense-impression, which as an affection of our mind is entirely subjective, but only, so far as I can see, on the reason (ibid., §27).

On this view of numbers the charm of work on arithmetic and analysis is, it seems to me, easily accounted for. We might say, indeed, almost in the well-known words: The reason's proper study is itself. In arithmetic we are not concerned with objects which we come to know as something alien from without through the medium of the senses, but with objects given directly to our reason and, as its nearest kin, utterly transparent to it. And yet, or rather for that very reason, these objects are not subjective fantasies. There is nothing more objective than the laws of  arithmetic" (ibid., §105).

The first passage above, in particular, recalls Kant´s idea that objectivity is not a feature of things-in-themselves, but of things as they are constituted and apprehended by means of logical forms of judgment, pure categories of understanding and pure forms of intuition. These latter constitute part of the transcendental as opposed to the subjective, psychological aspect of the mind according to Kant. Scholars who tend to read Frege from the perspective of Neo-Kantianism have therefore taken passages like those above as strong evidence for the thesis that his notion of objectivity was not dogmatically metaphysical but epistemological in the tradition of transcendental philosophy (cf. Sluga 1980:120).

In any case, it seems that under the presupposition of either a naive Platonist or a rationalist/transcendentalist account of the origins of objective thought contents, the strength of Frege's 1882 argument for the indispensability of symbols for human thought rests largely on assumptions about the causal influence of sensation on our train of thought. Indeed, as we saw, Frege had initiated this argument with observations about the effect of sense-impressions on our attention. In this he simply followed Leibniz, who – although a rationalist about the origin of thought – had granted that the senses are required to make the mind attentive to truths and to direct it towards some truths rather than others. For this reason, according to Leibniz, even though intellectual ideas and the truths arising from them do not "originate in the senses", without the senses we would never think of them (ibid., I, i, §§5, 11). Similarly, Kant points out in the Critique of Pure Reason that our empirical consciousness must be prompted by sensation or sensible impressions in order to have a beginning in time; hence "all our cognitions commence with experience" (1781/86:B1). Frege obviously agrees with Kant and Leibniz on this point, as he regards sense impressions as necessary – if not sufficient – for perception insofar as they "occasion our judgments" (1924/5, 1979:267; see also Frege's preface to Conceptual Notation, 1972:103). Indeed, with regard to the causality of consciousness we would be "as stupid as rocks" without sense impressions, "and should know nothing either of numbers or of anything else" (1953, §105, n.).

Given such presuppositions about the causal role sensation plays in the generation of actual processes of conscious thought, Frege can still make his case for the necessity of language for thinking by arguing as follows: Without sensible symbols, which – due to their intimate connection to reason (perhaps in the form of a set of innate ideas) – are able to draw our attention away from other sensory input and toward conceptual thought, our entire mental life would be largely dictated by the nature of our immediate sensations. Therefore, we would be psychologically unable to rise to higher forms of conscious awareness and contemplation than those provided by immediate sense perception and the fleeting memory images arising from it. This way of arguing would not commit him to the view that concepts or conceptual thought contents themselves depend for their existence on symbols or on any other sensible images. Rather, the dependence of human thought on language could itself be thought of as merely causal (Baker and Hacker 1984:65f.). As we saw before, Frege apparently sympathized with Leibniz's view that what is innate may need to be learned in order for us to become consciously aware of it. But if we need to learn about truths and concepts that have been in our understanding all along – as Leibniz saw it – then this is compatible with the claim that in order to learn them we need to use language.

Indeed, in a much later piece written and submitted for publication shortly before his death ("Sources of Knowledge of Mathematics and the Mathematical Natural Sciences"), Frege finally comes to explicitly commit himself to the view that language is necessary not for the existence of thought contents themselves, but only for our conscious awareness of them, that is, for our acts of thinking. In this context, he speaks of a "logical source of knowledge" and a "logical disposition" in us that must be at work in the formation of language, where he made use in 1882 of the ambiguous word "reason" and in 1918 of the expression "power of thinking" to denote a special mental capacity:

The senses present us with something external and because of this it is easier to comprehend how mistakes can occur than it is in the case of the logical source of knowledge which is wholly inside us and thus appears to be more proof against contamination. But appearances are deceptive. For our thinking is closely bound up with language and thereby with the world of the senses. Perhaps our thinking is at first a form of speaking which then becomes an imaging of speech. Silent thinking would in that case be speech that has become noiseless, taking place in the imagination. Now we may of course also think in mathematical signs; yet even then thinking is tied up with what is perceptible to the senses. To be sure, we distinguish the sentence as the expression of a thought from the thought itself. We know we can have various expressions for the same thought. The connection of a thought with one particular sentence is not a necessary one; but that a thought of which we are conscious is connected in our mind with some sentence or other is for us humans necessary.

But that does not lie in the nature of the thought but in our own nature. There is no contradiction in supposing there to exist beings that can grasp the same thought as we do without needing to clad it in a form that can be perceived by the senses. But still, for us humans there is this necessity. Language is a human creation; and so humans had, it would appear, the capacity to shape it in conformity with the logical disposition alive in them. Certainly the logical disposition of humans was at work in the formation of language but equally alongside this many other dispositions – such as the poetic disposition. And so language is not constructed from a logical "blueprint" (1979:269).

Here, Frege explains how it comes about that language in a certain sense "contaminates" the logical source of knowledge – that is, the faculty in us that enables us to have knowledge about logical structures and relations. As he sees it here, this logical disposition in us is not identical to the ability to speak a language, although it is required for the development and acquisition of a language. As he points out in a later passage,

If we disregard how thinking occurs in the consciousness of an individual, and attend instead to the true nature of thinking, we shall not be able to equate it with speaking. In that case we shall not derive thinking from speaking; thinking will then emerge as that which has priority and we shall not be able to blame thinking for the logical defects we have noted in language" (ibid.: 270).

Accordingly, thoughts are not to be identified with their linguistic expressions, and they do not in principle require any language in order to be accessible to rationally ideal beings that are capable of grasping them in an entirely non-sensible way. Presumably, these beings would possess a logical source of knowledge that is so powerful that it doesn't require language at all in order to produce acts of thought. This idea again recalls Leibniz's account of the nature of thought, and in particular of his admission that God and the angels were exactly such rational beings who do not – like human beings – require language in order to think (Leibniz 1704/1765, Bk. IV, ch. 5, §1). They do not require language precisely because their attention is not distracted or dominated by the continuous impact of sense impressions.

As opposed to this, Frege points out human beings require language in order to become conscious of a thought. And this, together with the fact that ordinary language – the kind of language in which human beings normally learn to think – is shaped also by other, less rational aspects of human nature, explains for Frege why actual human thought (as opposed to the bare content of pure thought, or that at which an act of thinking, as part of human consciousness, has to aim in order to be a thought at all) is prone to impurity through the influence of the language in which it is normally clad.

These results raise doubts about Michael Dummett's  notorious claim that Frege brought the modern tradition to an end by replacing epistemology with the theory of meaning as the foundation of philosophy in general (1981a: 669f.).  Dummett's central claim about Frege's philosophy of language is that Frege simply converted traditional problems of epistemology into questions about language (1991: 111-112).  The question, for instance, of how "numbers [are] given to us, if we cannot have any ideas or intuitions of them" raised by Frege in §62 of Foundations, is clearly epistemological. However, according to Dummett, it simply becomes the question of how we refer to, that is, succeed in talking about, numbers. And as Dummett understands this question, it is answered simply by Frege's account of the meanings of conventionally introduced expressions. The problem with this interpretation is that, presumably, for Frege any complete account of how expressions can possess meaning at all would have to involve a complete account of how we can grasp and understand pure thoughts – and it does not appear that he thought this question could be sufficiently answered with recourse to language simply because for Frege language itself presupposes certain rational capacities in order to be capable of expressing thoughts.

This seems to be precisely why Frege repeatedly takes refuge in various metaphors to indicate the existence of certain rational faculties that enable us to grasp a thought, like the mysterious "power of thinking" that he talks about in "Thought". Indeed, in a draft dating from 1897 he explicitly describes the act of thinking as "perhaps the most mysterious of all", and adds that he regards the question of how it is possible as "still far from being grasped in all its difficulty" (1979:145). At the same time, he explicitly denies that this question could ever be answered in terms of empirical psychology or in terms of logic. Certainly, then, he could not seriously hold that specifying a relation between expressions and what they designate, or between sentences and their truth-values, could ever fully replace the question of how it is possible that we can think of anything at all.

Consequently, this also means that a philosophy of language in Frege's view could never be more than a fragment of a complete philosophy of human thought, albeit an important one. Dummett is aware that in this sense, Frege's philosophical account of thought and understanding is still incomplete; however, it is doubtful that Frege would have agreed that it could be completed by reflecting further on the uses and functions of language – which is Dummett's own proposal (1981:413). In fact, whether the question of what thoughts consist in and what their preconditions are could be completely settled within the philosophy of language or not has been one of the major – and most interesting – issues of dispute in 20th century analytic philosophy.  (For detailed discussions of Dummett's interpretation of Frege see Dummett and Lotter 2004, chap. 2.4.)

2. The Formal Language Approach

We now begin to understand why language was a serious matter to Frege, even though he did not consider it his primary object of interest. His interest in the philosophy of language was based on his firm belief that language is necessary for human thought, and it was triggered in particular by his investigations into the foundations of mathematics, in which he faced a serious problem concerning the symbolic tools that were available at the time for such investigations. In his 1919 "Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter," he describes the problem that first led him to investigate language as follows:

I started out from mathematics. The most pressing need, it seemed to me, was to provide this science with a better foundation. I soon realized that number is not a heap, a series of things, nor a property of a heap either, but that in stating a number that we have arrived at as the result of counting we are making a statement about a concept.

The logical imperfections of language stood in the way of such investigations. I tried to overcome these obstacles with my concept-script. In this way I was led from mathematics to logic" (1979:253).

Frege Points out that the logical imperfections of language – by which he means the natural language of everyday life, or the "language of life", as he sometimes calls it – had proven to be an obstacle for his investigations into the ontology of numbers and the epistemology of mathematics, especially arithmetic. He was trying to find out whether all arithmetic formulas could be proven on the basis of logical axioms and definitions alone, and whether numbers could therefore be construed as logical objects – a view that later came to be called "logicism." In order to find this out, Frege had to see just "how far one could get in arithmetic by inferences alone, supported only by the laws of thought that transcend all particulars" (1997:48). However, the formula language of arithmetic, in which numbers and their relations are expressed, did not contain expressions for specifically logical relations; and ordinary language proved to be insufficiently transparent with regard to the discovery of logical relations – especially logical consequence – to serve Frege's purposes well. Therefore, Frege decided to create what he regarded as a logically superior notational system for arithmetic – a notational system that was supposed to be as transparent as possible with respect to the logical structure of thought in that area, and one that contained symbols not only for arithmetical entities but also for specifically logical relations and concepts. Moreover, each term contained or introduced into this notational system should be given a precise and fixed meaning by way of definitions in terms of small number of primitive terms.

a. The Concept Script

Following Adolf Trendelenburg (in his 1867 essay "On Leibniz's Project of a Universal Characteristic") Frege baptized his new symbolic system "Begriffsschrift".  (Although "Begriffsschrift" is usually translated as "concept script" or "conceptual notation", it is sometimes translated differently; in Frege 1952, for example, it is translated as "ideography".)  He gives two independent reasons for the choice of this terminology: First – as he explains in the preface to Conceptual Notation – because in it all and only that part of the content of natural language expressions is to be represented that is of significance for logical inference; and this is what Frege called the "conceptual content" of an expression (1997:49). Secondly – as we learn again from his 1882 piece mentioned earlier – Frege means by "Begriffsschrift" a symbolic system in which, contrary to natural language, the written symbols come to express their subject matter directly, that is, without the intervention of speech (1972:88). In this way, expressions of conceptual content could be radically abbreviated; for instance, a simple statement could be accommodated in one line as a formula of the concept script. Frege also decided to represent complex statements of propositional logic – statements linking two or more simple statements – in a two-dimensional manner for reasons of perspicuity.

Historically, the idea of a concept script derives from the Leibnizian project of developing a so-called "universal characteristic" (characteristica universalis): A universal symbolic system in which every complex concept is completely defined based on a set of primitive concepts and logical rules of inference and definition, and which thus enables us to make the conceptual structure of our universe explicit. Such a symbolic system would also contain a logical calculus (calculus ratiocinator) consisting of purely syntactic inference rules based on the types of symbols used within the formal language. However, according to the Leibnizian conception, logic itself is not merely a calculus but expressible in an ideal language, that is, in the universal characteristic. Frege certainly adopted this view of logic from Leibniz; his main source of his understanding of Leibniz's conception very likely was again Trendelenburg's essay (Sluga 1980, ch. 2.4). However, 20th and 21st century mainstream analytic philosophy has somewhat misleadingly characterized Frege as regarding logic itself as a universal language rather than a calculus (for example, van Heijenoort, 1967).

The latter characterization is misleading for two reasons. The first is that, as we have seen, Frege did not regard language as the source of thought contents; he did regard logic, however, as consisting of (true) thought contents (though this has been recently disputed for the Frege of the Conceptual Notation period in Linnebo 2003). Hence, he could not have regarded logic as being identical with any language. Secondly, Frege did not actually attempt to develop his concept script as a universal language in Leibniz's sense (though he agrees that logic itself contains universally applicable laws of thought). Rather, he held the more cautious belief that if such a language could be developed at all, its development would have to proceed gradually, in a step-by-step manner:

"Arithmetical, geometrical and chemical symbols can be regarded as realizations of the Leibnizian conception in particular fields. The concept script offered here adds a new one to these – indeed, the one located in the middle, adjoining all the others. From here, with the greatest prospect of success, one can then proceed to fill in the gaps in the existing formula languages, connect their hitherto separate fields into the domain of a single formula language and extend it to fields that have hitherto lacked such a language" (1997:50).

Thus, Frege intended his concept script primarily for the expression of logical relations within the realm of arithmetic – the field that he saw as located in the middle of all other areas of possible inquiry. He did seem optimistic that his concept-script could be successfully applied "wherever a special value has to be placed on the validity of proof" (ibid.); and this seemed appropriate not only with regard to mathematics but also with regard to "fields where, besides conceptual necessity, natural necessity prevails" – that is, the pure theory of motion, mechanics and physics (ibid.). He also expressed – in the 1882 piece mentioned earlier – the belief that in principle the concept-script could be applied wherever logical relations pertain, and that therefore philosophers as well should pay attention to it. However, he was never ambitious or even interested in examining how it could be applied to areas that were remote from arithmetic.

Frege's revival of the idea of a universal, logically ideal language for the analysis and advancement of science and human knowledge subsequently became extremely influential especially through the writings of Russell and the early Wittgenstein and it contributed to the development of Logical Positivism in the first half of the 20th century. Rudolf Carnap and other members of the Vienna Circle actually worked on the establishment of a universal formal language of science in which not only every scientific theory could be expressed in a unified way, but also every meaningful philosophical problem would be soluble by way of logical reconstruction (Carnap 1928a and 1928b). Still in the fifties and sixties of the last century, after attempts at establishing a universal formal language of science had eventually proven unsuccessful, Nelson Goodman practiced and endorsed an axiomatic approach -- based on the idea of multiple formal reconstructions of certain areas of philosophical inquiry -- for investigating the conceptual relation between universals and particulars and between the world of phenomenal experience and that of physical objects (Goodman 1951, 1963). Frege, by contrast, never applied his concept-script to fields other than logic and mathematics, choosing an informal, argumentative (rather than formal) and "constructivist" approach to dealing with philosophical issues arising from – or underlying – his logicist project. Some remarks in the preface to Conceptual Notation might give us a clue as to why he did not go so far as Carnap and Goodman in his adherence to formula language in philosophical inquiry. There, Frege uses the analogy of the microscope and the eye in order to explain the relation between ordinary language (or the "language of life", as Frege calls it) and concept-script:

The latter (that is, the eye), because of the range of its applicability and because of the ease with which it can adapt itself to the most varied circumstances, has a great superiority over the microscope. Of course, viewed as an optical instrument it reveals many imperfections, which usually remain unnoticed only because of its intimate connection with mental life. But as soon as scientific purposes place strong requirements upon sharpness of resolution, the eye proves to be inadequate. On the other hand, the microscope is perfectly suited for just such purposes; but, for this very reason, it is useless for all others" (1972:105).

According to Frege, the concept-script is not to replace ordinary language in all its uses; on the contrary, he regards it as "useless" in all contexts but "scientific" ones. Given this belief, it remains undecided whether Frege regarded philosophy itself as an entirely scientific discipline or whether he thought that there are areas of philosophy in which the concept-script would be useless in principle. That he never even considered formalizing his claims about perception, meaning, the nature of thought, or the basis of objectivity may be taken as some evidence for the latter, although it would not be conclusive.

b. The Logical Imperfections of Ordinary Language

What all of these "formal language" approaches have in common is not merely the insight that ordinary language lacks a certain amount of transparency when it comes to exploring the meanings and logical relations between words and sentences. It is moreover the assumption that an artificial formula language is in principle able to capture the logical structure of thought – or even of the world itself as it is reflected in thought – better than any natural language that characterizes the approach to language taken by Frege – and after him Russell, the early Wittgenstein, and the Logical Positivists.

The following is a brief survey of what Frege considered the most prominent logical impurities of natural language that stood in the way of his logical investigations into the foundations of arithmetic, and how Frege thought them to be eliminated in a logically perfect language like his concept-script.

i. Non-Observance of the Difference Between Concept and Object

According to Frege, the difference between concept and object is not generally well observed in natural languages. Often, the same word serves to designate both a concept and an object that falls under it. The word "horse", for instance, sometimes serves to denote a concept, as in "This is a horse", other times a single object, as in "This horse is black", and sometimes also an entire biological species, as in "The horse is an herbivorous animal" (1972:84). Even though we could read the second sentence above as "There is exactly one x at location y such that x is a horse and x is black", thereby maintaining the same logical category for "horse" as in the first sentence, this syntactical structure is not transparent in ordinary language. In a logically ideal language, by contrast, every word or complex expression would have to stand for exactly one object, concept, or relation, and it would have to be clear from the syntax of the language -- that is, from the syntactical categories of the expressions themselves -- to which of those ontological categories the entity designated belongs. Thus, the logical syntax of the language would reflect the logical structure within the realm of entities to which it is applied.

The main rationale for Frege's strict distinction between concepts and objects, as well as their corresponding syntactic categories, appears to lie in his understanding of logical unity. In his "Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter" Frege points out that:

[W]here logic is concerned, it seems that every combination of parts results from completing something that is in need of supplementation; where logic is concerned, no whole can consist of saturated parts alone. The sharp separation of what is in need of supplementation from what is saturated is very important" (1983:254).

Frege does not think that a logical unit such as a sentence,  a thought, or truth value could consist of components all of which are logically complete; such components could not really hang together to constitute a logical whole. Rather, in order to account for the possibility of logically complex units at all, we have to assume that they are composed of a combination of two types of logical components; saturated, complete, self-subsisting ones, on the one hand, and unsaturated, incomplete ones – ones that essentially are in need of supplementation – on the other. On the level of ontology, Frege calls every unsaturated entity a "concept" or "relation", and every saturated one an "object". Up until the very last phase of his intellectual career, he included in the latter category not only physical things, and psychological events, but also abstract entities like sets, numbers, truth values, and even entire thoughts (in his specific sense of that which is grasped in an act of thinking).

On the syntactic level, the contrast between saturated and unsaturated entities is reflected in the distinction between proper names, on the one hand, and predicates (which Frege calls "concept-words") on the other. In this sense, we can say that in Frege, syntactic distinctions as well as relations are not only presupposed in the creation of any meaningful linguistic unit but they already have a meaning in themselves. Thus, the mere combination of a proper name with a predicate in a logically ideal language as such already expresses something – namely, it expresses that an object falls under a concept (which was for Frege the most basic logical relation one can think of).

A proper name in Frege's sense is any singular expression, that is, a proper name is any expression that serves to designate one and only one particular object; a predicate, by contrast, designates a concept or a relation. Thus, the class of Fregean proper names in ordinary language comprises not only names in the narrow sense like "Aristotle" but also any other expression that is used to refer to one particular object. Notoriously, since at least from 1891 onwards Frege conceives of truth values as objects and of sentences as referring to truth values (1892a), he regards complete sentences of ordinary language as proper names as well – unlike assertions or asserted judgments, which are represented in the concept script by means of an assertion sign (1906a; 1979:195).

ii. Empty Proper Names

Besides its lack of exact correspondence between syntactical and ontological categories, another problem of ordinary language – which Frege encountered not only in fictional but also in scientific contexts – is that of empty proper names. These are grammatically well-formed singular expressions that do not happen to denote anything, or that apply to more than one thing and therefore do not actually fulfill their function as singular terms. One example that Frege cites is the syntactically well-formed expression "the celestial body most distant from the Earth"; it is doubtful whether this expression denotes anything at all. This is even more obvious with expressions like "the least rapidly convergent series", which are just as void of an object of designation as is the name "Odysseus" (1892a; 1952:58; 1997:153). In his very late phase, Frege traces back the paradoxes of set theory, which brought about the failure of his logicist project, to this very problem of empty singular terms in natural language, as it had misled him into believing that sets,  (that is, extensions of concepts) and numbers were logical objects (1979:269f.; 1997:369f.).

In a logically perfect language, by contrast, "every expression grammatically well constructed as a proper name out of signs already introduced shall in fact designate an object, and... no new sign shall be introduced as a proper name without being secured a significance" (1952:70, 1997:163). In addition Frege suggested that, if need be, an artificial significance could be stipulated for all those proper names that turn out to lack reference to an actually existing object (ibid.).

iii. The Vagueness of Predicates

According to Frege, while proper names serve to designate objects, concept-words serve to designate concepts, which as such belong to an entirely separate logical category (1892:5). This is also reflected in the use of concept-words, which -- in contrast to proper names -- can refer even if no object falls under the concept they designate (1979:123ff). Nonetheless, a concept-word lacks significance just like an empty proper name if it does not clearly express under which conditions an object falls under the designated concept and under which it doesn't. For Frege, the logic of pure thought cannot acknowledge concepts with undetermined boundaries (1891a, 1891b).

It seems obvious that most, if not all, concept-words in natural language lack the kind of semantic precision that Frege expects of a logically perfect language. For instance, do we know exactly under what conditions anyone falls under the concept of baldness and under what conditions s/he does not? If not then – barring the remote possibility that there really is a sharp boundary of which we are more or less ignorant – most if not all ordinary language concept-words have vague meanings in Frege's sense. Hence, strictly speaking most, if not all, concept-words in ordinary language would lack significance, according to Frege's logic.

In a logically perfect language – as Frege conceived of it – the vagueness of predicates could be eliminated through their arrangement in an axiomatic system, through logical analysis, as well as informal elucidations and clarification of the primitive terms by way of examples. Frege strictly distinguishes definitions from illustrative examples. The latter, together with other forms of elucidation, merely serve to clarify the meanings of primitive signs (signs whose meanings cannot be analyzed further into logical components). Theoretically, one would never be able to fully clarify the meaning of such an expression by way of examples; however, according to Frege "we do manage to come to an understanding about the meanings of words" in practice. Whether we do, of course, will in this case always depend on a "meeting of minds, on others guessing what we have in mind" (1914/1979:207).

Definitions in the proper sense are constructive, in that they introduce a new sign to abbreviate a more complex expression that we have constructed out of its logical components. Frege distinguishes from these purely stipulative definitions cases of what were in his time called "analytic definitions". These display a logical analysis of the sense of a sign that has long been in use before by identifying its sense with that of a complex expression; this sense then is a function of the senses of the latter's logical parts. In this case the meaning equation is not a mere matter of arbitrary stipulation but can only be recognized by "an immediate insight."

iv. Grammatical versus Logical Categories

For Frege, the logician's main goal in her struggle with language is to "separate the logical from the psychological;" that is, the logician's main goal in her struggle with language is to isolate the logically relevant aspects of grammar and meaning from those that are not. Frege defines "logically relevant aspects of grammar" as only those aspects of language that have a bearing on logical inference (1979:4). Accordingly, as philosophers interested in pure thought we "have to turn our backs on" any grammatical distinctions and elements of meaning that are not relevant for logical inferences, or that may even obscure them.

This includes, but is not limited to, the grammatical distinction between the subject and the predicate of a sentence, which Frege contends misled logicians for centuries. Grammatically speaking, the subject of a sentence is the expression that signifies what the sentence is "about", or as Frege puts it, the subject of the sentence is "the concept with which the judgment is chiefly concerned" (1979:113). The predicate, by contrast, would then be the expression that signifies what is being said about the subject or, alternatively, the concept that is applied to the subject. So, for instance, in the sentence "Archimedes perished at the conquest of Syracuse," the word "Archimedes" appears to be the subject; and "…perished at the conquest of Syracuse, "the predicate. According to Frege, however, the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate, which used to be the model for traditional logic, does not match the logical structure of that part of the content of sentences that is relevant for logic.

More precisely, Frege thought the distinction between subject and predicate to be neither necessary nor sufficient to describe the logical structure of thought. It is not necessary because it yields distinctions between sentences that appear to have the same logical power of inference. For instance, the following two sentences obviously are grammatically distinct:

(1) "At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians."
(2) "At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks."

In (1) "the Greeks" appears to be the grammatical subject, while in (2) it is "the Persians". Yet from a logical point of view the two sentences have the same conceptual content, and therefore do not need to be distinguished in a logically perfect language (ibid.:112f.); all the consequences that can be derived from (1) combined with certain others can also be derived from (2) combined with the same others, which means that the logically relevant part of their content, which Frege decides to call "conceptual content", is the same.

The second reason why Frege thought the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate is unnecessary for the expression of, or distinction between, conceptual contents and their components is that, logically speaking, the linguistic expression of a judgment or assertion can always be rephrased as a combination of a nominal phrase, which contains the entire conceptual content, and a grammatical predicate like "is a fact" or "is true", which does not add anything to that content. Hence, as Frege points out, "we can imagine a language in which the proposition "Archimedes perished at the conquest of Syracuse" would be expressed in the following way: "The violent death of Archimedes at the conquest of Syracuse is a fact" (1879, §3; 1972:113). In such a case the grammatical subject contains the whole content of the judgment and the predicate serves only to present this content as a judgment; hence, strictly speaking, nothing at the level of conceptual content -- at the level of what is relevant to logical inference -- corresponds to the predicate here. In fact, for Frege a logically ideal language like the concept-script is a language in which the only grammatical predicate is "is a fact", represented by a combination of the so-called judgment stroke " |-" and the content stroke "~"; and occurring to the left of judgable contents (" ….") (1879, §2). Because Frege conceives of such contents as identical to the contents of nominal phrases and thus all complete expressions in his system are names (or "terms" in Russellian terminology), his sentential logic today is sometimes called "term logic" (for example, Zalta 2004) as opposed to standard propositional logic, in which propositions or sentences are regarded as a logical category distinct from both predicates and terms.

Furthermore, even for cases when we do seem to be able to use the distinction between predicate and subject to analyze judgable contents into their components, Frege thought the grammatical opposition of subject and predicate to be insufficient for capturing important logical distinctions that apply to the contents of sentences in a logically ideal language. In particular, it does not appear to suffice for an analysis of the differences between singular, particular, and general propositions. Singular propositions, according to Frege, are those in which an object is subsumed or falls under a concept; this is what he regarded as the fundamental relation in logic to which all others can be reduced (1979:118). Nevertheless, for the purposes of understanding the structure and logical impact of general and existential propositions, Frege distinguishes two other structural relations within conceptual contents: First, that of subordination or bringing something under something else, which pertains between two concepts of the same logical order; and second, that of a concept's falling within a concept of higher order.

In a proposition like "All whales are mammals", for instance, the expression "all whales" again appears as grammatical subject, but "all whales" does not seem to denote a particular object, hence it cannot be construed as a proper name. Instead, what we actually mean is this: "If anything is a whale then it is a mammal". This indicates that what the sentence actually is about is a relation between two concepts, that of a whale and that of a mammal. What the sentence says about these concepts is that whatever falls under the first also falls under the second; it thereby subordinates the first under the second concept (1979:119; 1884, §47). However, the second concept is not a property of the first; being a mammal is not a property of the concept of being a whale but rather of the objects falling under that concept, just as being a whale itself is. Hence, the two concepts are of the same logical order – they both apply to objects.

This is different in statements that concern the existence of things of a certain kind. If one says "Mammals exist", or "Some mammals are elephants" then one is not talking about about any particular mammal or elephant but rather about the concepts of a mammal or an elephant; and what one means is that these concepts are satisfied in at least one case. Frege, therefore, regards existence as a concept of the second order. A concept of the second order is one that applies to concepts of the first order; that is, a concept of the second order does not apply to objects but to concepts of the first order, and it is concepts of the first order, not concepts of the second order, that apply directly to objects. Thus, contrary to the use of ordinary language, statements like "Caesar exists" turn out to be senseless because they contain a category mistake (1892b/1997:189). By contrast, we could meaningfully say, "There is one man named 'Caesar;'" but in this case one is again ascribing existence to a concept; that is, one is ascribing existence to the concept of being named "Caesar". Moreover, if one rephrases her original singular existence statement as "There is one and only one man named Caesar", she does not only say something false (for surely there have been plenty of people baptized "Caesar") but is again just referring to the concept of being named "Caesar;" that is, one is again incorrectly stating that the name "Caesar" applies to exactly one object.

For these reasons, Frege decided to replace the traditional logical distinction between subject and predicate (which in his view is derived from the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate expressions) with the distinction between function and argument a distinction with which he was familiar through his expertise in mathematical analysis. In Conceptual Notation, this distinction is introduced in connection with the notion of judgment. For Frege, "in the expression of a judgment we can always regard the combination of symbols to the right of the turnstile as a function of one of the symbols occurring in it" (1879, §11).  As one can see, the terms "function" and "argument" apply to to expressions rather than to what they stand for. In Conceptual Notation those terms in fact are still used for both; only later did Frege reserve them for those entities that a functional expression and an argument expression respectively stand for.

Functional expressions typically contain placeholders (or variables), which in singular sentences have to be replaced by an argument in order to determine a definite truth-value. For instance, the expression "2 + x = 5" is functional in the sense that its truth-value depends on the value of the variable "x" that occurs in it. If "x" is replaced by "3" then the expression becomes a true sentence or formula of arithmetic; if it is replaced by any other numeral the resulting sentence or formula will be false. Thus, for Frege a function is what such a functional expression stands for. A potential argument for that function is an entity denoted by an expression that serves to supplement the functional expression so as to yield a complete sentence. On the basis of this distinction between function and argument, Frege achieved a new, mathematically oriented understanding of concepts and relations: a concept simply is a function whose value always is a truth value for any suitable argument, and a relation is a function that has more than one such argument place. This idea of concepts or relations as functions covers even cases of higher-order properties: those are conceived of as functions that take on only other, lower-order functions as arguments so as to determine a truth-value. Finally, by contrast to subject-predicate analyses of expressions and their meanings, the distinction between function and argument can be applied also to those logical components that do not by themselves constitute complete sentences, that is, the distinction can be applied to operations like that expressed by "the father of ( )".

v. The Intermingling of Subjective and Objective Aspects of Meaning

The general motivation for Frege's abandonment of logical distinctions that are, in his view, still too close to the grammar of natural language was his conviction that ordinary language grammar "is a mixture of the logical and the psychological" (1979:3)  He thought that theses two areas of inquiry should be strictly distinguished both with regard to the questions they raise and to their respective ways of answering them. This anti-psychologism about logic itself extends also to the contents of natural language and thought. As we saw above, one of Frege's reasons for calling his symbolic system "concept-script" was the fact that it was supposed to represent only that part of the content of natural language expressions that is of significance for logical inference. This implies, however, that according to Frege the content of ordinary language expressions comprises more than just their "conceptual content". Frege is quite explicit about this point both in early and in later writings. Concerning the two sentences "At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians" and "At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks" he points out in Begriffsschrift that:

Even if one can perceive a slight difference in sense, the agreement still predominates. Now I call the part of the content which is the same in both the conceptual content" (1972, §3:112).

It seems clear that the words "sense" and "content" are being used to cover both logically relevant and other aspects of the meaning of a linguistic expression; for the former constitute only part of the content of an expression. The meaning of "sense" (Sinn) in Frege's later writings comes closer to that of "conceptual content" in his earlier works. However, the general word "content" still appears to retain its very broad use in works that were written even after Frege's famous distinction between sense and significance. In a letter to Husserl, for instance, Frege points out that the content of a sentence can include more than just that which can be true or false: for example, a sentence content can also contain "a mood, feelings, and ideas", none of which can be judged as true or false and none of which, therefore, concerns logic (1906b:106). Note that at this point, interestingly, Frege's criterion of the logical relevance of linguistic content is no longer articulated in terms of inference but rather in terms of the capacity to be true or false. Frege here lays the ground for that movement in 20th century philosophy of language that rests on the principle that linguistic meaning consists solely in truth conditions, and that therefore a theory of meaning can either be derived from or is identical to a theory of truth – a movement whose most prominent representative was Donald Davidson.

However, the isolated word "content" in Frege's own writings still covers both logically relevant and logically irrelevant aspects of ordinary language meaning. Hence, to distinguish the two, and sort out the latter, is in Frege's view one of the main tasks of the logician. What is also peculiar about Frege's view of natural language content is that he appears to regard all of that part of it which is logically irrelevant as being purely subjective and thus a matter only of psychology, as his mentioning of "moods, feelings, and ideas" already shows. That is, he does not appear to recognize any but subjective and purely psychological meaning elements that are not, strictly speaking, logically relevant. He writes:

The task of logic being what it is, it follows that we must turn our backs on anything that is not necessary for setting up the laws of inference. In particular, we must reject all distinctions in logic that are made from a purely psychological standpoint and have no bearing on inference.... In the form in which thinking naturally develops the logical and the psychological are bound up together. The task in hand is precisely that of isolating what is logical" (between 1879 and 1891, in 1979:3).

According to Frege, such logically irrelevant distinctions include "all aspects of language that result only from the interaction of speaker and listener" such as all information conveyed to the latter by way of intonation or word-order in order to draw the listener's attention to a particular part of speech (between 1879 and 1891, in 1979:3). They also include merely connotational differences between words denoting the same entities, as exemplified by groups of expressions like "walk", "stroll", and "saunter". Though all of these expressions stand for the same concept, Frege thinks that they all act in different ways on the imagination of the listener, adding to the meaning of the sentences in which they are used an element that is irrelevant to logical inference. Whether one says, "This dog howled the whole night", or one says, "This cur howled the whole night," makes no difference with regard to the logical inferences one can draw from them in connection with sentences, nor with regard to their truth or falsity. One tends to associate with the word "cur" rather unpleasant ideas;  however, for Frege, even if one disagrees that these associations match the dog in question, this would still not make the second sentence above false (1979:140).

According to how Frege characterizes these extra-logical, yet, rule-governed features of ordinary language meaning, these are not different from the merely arbitrary association of images with certain words in the minds of individual speakers. In other words, the difference between the meanings of the words "dog" and "cur" would be just as intangible and subjective as the difference between the internal image that a horseman, painter, or zoologist may have come to associate with the name "Bucephalus" and which Frege considers just as subjective "coloring and shading" of a piece of linguistic information (1997:154). And while Frege admits that "without some affinity in human ideas art would certainly be impossible," he does not seem to see – or be interested in exploring – the conventional rules that govern the difference in meaning between the pejorative "cur" and the neutral "dog"(1997:155).

In other words, Frege does not even seem to acknowledge an entire field of philosophy of language that has been explored subsequently by John Austin, John Searle, Paul Grice and others and that is based on the assumption that we can philosophically – not just psychologically – explore the meaning of utterances as opposed to, or even underlying, the meaning of sentences. Frege reduces this entire area of inquiry to "all aspects of language that result only from the interaction of speaker and listener", and he thereby overlooks that the phenomena described above do not result just from the interaction between two people. Rather, they are either based on conventional rules and maxims – adherence to which is generally rational or even essential for the possibility of linguistic communication – or at least presuppose knowledge of some such maxims or conventions in order to be properly understood. Therefore, solutions of problems connected to speaker meaning and speech acts are not at all just a matter of psychology; rather, they are at least as philosophically important in any comprehensive account of linguistic communication as problems of the relation between expressions and things in the world, or between expression and what they express.

3. From Conceptual Contents to Sinn and Bedeutung: The Development of Frege's Semantics

The development of Frege's view of the semantics of a logically perfect language can be divided up in two major phases, corresponding to two styles of semantic analysis that Frege consecutively adopted. Following Alberto Coffa, we can regard the first as a form of semantic monism and the second as a form of semantic dualism (1991:79f.). What both styles have in common is a broadly picture-theoretic idea of the relation between language and world, and a corresponding ideal of semantic analysis; to serve its purpose, language has to be partitioned into basic syntactical units, each of which is to be associated with an appropriate semantic correlate, which is conceived as an entity. For this reason, monism and dualism can also be regarded as varieties of an entity theory of meaning as defined more recently by Lycan (2000: 78, 83). This is so at least if we keep in mind that for Frege not all those entities that his semantic theory associates with linguistic expressions are supposed to be "individual things", as Lycan's characterization of an entity theory of meaning suggests. Rather, as we have seen, some semantic entities in Frege are intrinsically incomplete, like concepts and relations.

A disagreement between monism and dualism arises with regard to the number and character of the entities that are associated with the logical components of sentences. The monist believes that only one such entity needs to be postulated in order to explain how linguistic expressions mean anything and how sentences can be true or false. The dualist, by contrast, holds that linguistic expressions can have truth value potential only if we assign them not one but two different kinds of values, one of which then becomes our link to extra-linguistic reality (that is, to the entities denoted by expressions of our language).

a. The Monism of Frege's Early Semantics

Frege's early account of semantics given in Conceptual Notation and Foundations appears to be monistic in the sense above. Frege's early semantics is based on the notion of a conceptual content, that is, it is based on that part of meaning that is relevant for logical inferences. The class of conceptual contents in turn is divided up into judgable and non-judgable ones, whereby the former are logically composed of and can be decomposed into the latter. What Frege may have had in mind – although he does not put it exactly this way – with his distinction between judgable and non-judgable contents is the following consideration: a judgable content is such that we can reasonably either affirm or deny it: it is acceptable to say "Archimedes's death is/is not true", where one of the two alternatives must be correct. Thus, "Archimedes death" is a judgable content. However, this is different in a statement like "This house is/is not true " – unless we take it to be elliptic for something like "The existence of this house is/is not true". For a house by itself (unlike its existence) does not belong to the category of things for which the question of whether they are true or false is logically appropriate under the law of excluded middle (tertium non datur), since by itself it can be neither true nor false (alternatively, we can say that it is both not true and not false). For this reason, "this house" is a non-judgable content.

In Conceptual Notation and Foundations, Frege does not appear to acknowledge any ontological difference between a non-judgable content and the object or function that the expression having this content stands for. There are at least three main pieces of textual as well as theoretical evidence for this. The first has to do with Frege's early account of identity as a relation between signs.  Conceptual content in Frege's early account is explained by recourse to the illustrative example of the the two propositions "At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians" and "At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks". This appears to be the first example Frege gives for the relation of "identity of content". The relation then is explicitly introduced in §8 of Conceptual Notation. There it is explained in the following way:

Identity of content differs from conditionality and negation by relating to names, not to contents. Although symbols are usually only representative of their contents...they at once appear in propria persona as soon as they are combined by the symbol for identity of content, for this signifies the circumstance that the two names have the same content" (1972:124).

As Frege points out, the symbol of content identity has the peculiarity that wherever it is used the resulting judgment no longer is about the contents of the names connected by the identity sign but rather about those names themselves. What such a judgment of identity expresses then is that those names have the same content, whatever this content is. Because Frege considers judgable contents to be fully expressible by nominal phrases of the form "The violent death of Archimedes at the conquest of Syracuse", and as he considers the concept-script to be a symbolism in which every judgable content is so expressed, we can include names and nominal phrases that stand for judgable contents among the symbols that are suitable candidates for the relation of content identity.

Somewhat later in the same paragraph, Frege goes on to explain what exactly he means by the content of a name in the context of identity of content. He does so in order to show why the identity sign does not merely serve to state trivial tautologies or to introduce abbreviations for complex expressions. Taking an example from geometry he lets a straight line rotate about a fixed point 'A' on the circumference of a circle. This shows that 'A' can be determined in various ways; for instance, it can be determined either directly through perception, or indirectly, through a description. 'A' is also uniquely determined as the point corresponding to the rotating straight line's being perpendicular to the diameter of the circle on 'A'. Thus, for Frege the need of a special symbol for identity of content rests on the fact that the same content, in this case point 'A', can be determined in different ways and that this fact cannot always be known in advance; rather, it is itself the content of a judgment that requires proof.

Thus, what Frege regards as the conceptual content of a geometrical name, that is, of the description of a single object, appears to be the object itself: the same train of thought that he applied to geometrical points, their ways of determination, and their names, can also be applied to physical (or any other) objects.  Frege contends that the conceptual content of the name "evening star" is the planet Venus, as is the conceptual content of the name "morning star", though this content is determined in each case in a different way. In the case of names for judgable contents, the object seems to be a true or false circumstance, whereby its truth or falsity are themselves to be regarded as part of the conceptual content in this case. For after his distinction between sense and significance Frege would point out that he has now divided up what he regarded as judgable content in his earlier account into the thought on the one hand and its truth value on the other (1891c:63). Thus, a judgable content in Frege's early semantics comprises both aspects while – at least in the case of names – a non-judgable content does not appear to contain more than the object denoted by the name. It does not, apparently, contain the way this object is determined – instead, this way of being determined is conceived of as part of the name itself: there is, in a certain sense, no clear logical distinction between the name as a purely syntactic string of characters and its symbolic character or force, in virtue of which it is able to pick out the object it denotes, in Frege's early semantics.

More concrete evidence for the monistic character of Frege's early semantics arises from the fact that it does not allow for the difference between meaningful sentences that lack a truth-value on the one hand, and sentences that are completely meaningless on the other. In other words, it does not account for the existence of sentences expressing mock thoughts, which are so plentiful both in fiction and everyday life. This would not be so, had Frege's early semantics incorporated a second layer of meaning, which a sentence or expression can possess even if nothing exists to which it actually refers. Frege appears to be quite aware of the advantage that his later distinction between sense and significance in this respect provided. In Foundations he still took it for granted that an expression that fails to denote anything lacks any sense or meaning (1884, §§97: 100-102). After his distinction between sense and significance, however, he is quick to point out that he would now prefer to replace the word "Sinn" ("sense") in those contexts by "Bedeutung" ("reference" or "significance") (1980:63).

Finally, objects and concepts – the entities that expressions of a logically perfect notational system would stand for – are discussed in Foundations in the context of Frege's distinction between objective and subjective ideas, a distinction that was supposed to help clarify Kant's "true views":

An idea [Vorstellung] in the subjective sense is what is governed by the psychological laws of association; it is of a sensible, pictorial character. An idea in the objective sense belongs to logic and is in principle non-sensible, although the word which refers to an objective idea is often accompanied by a subjective idea, which nevertheless is not its significance. Subjective ideas are often demonstrably different in different people, objective ideas are the same for all. Objective ideas can be divided into objects and concepts. I shall myself, to avoid confusion, use "idea" only in the subjective sense. It is because Kant associated both meanings with the word that his doctrine assumed such a very subjective, idealist complexion, and his true view was made so difficult to discover. The distinction here drawn stands or falls with that between psychology and logic. If only these themselves were to be kept always rigidly distinct!" (1884, §27, n.).

Frege claims to have clarified the Kantian view with his distinction between objective and subjective ideas. It is disputable just how serious we are to take this lip service to Kantianism, and it is also doubtful that Kant would have accepted Frege's proposed amendment – for Kant and Frege do not appear to have shared the same notion of objectivity. Nevertheless, Frege's terminological amendment here certainly serves to clarify his own earlier terminology; for in Conceptual Notation, he still uses the expression "combinations of ideas" to refer to judgable contents (1879, §2). In light of this, however, claiming that objective ideas can be divided up into objects and concepts, as Frege does in the above passage, supports the notion that those judgable contents -- as combinations of objective ideas -- were at the same time combinations of objects and concepts. Thus, this too supports the claim that early Fregean linguistic symbols have only one semantic dimension, namely, the objects, concepts, and true or false judgable contents that they designate.

One should note that Frege's distinction between subjective and objective ideas (the latter includes physical objects and properties), as well as his later distinction between the inner and the outer realms of entities, suggests that "subjective", inner states of the mind (like acts of thinking) cannot be conceived of in physical terms. This, of course, is in striking contrast to physicalist accounts of "the mental" and may strike many contemporary philosophers of mind as naive.

b. Sense and Significance

Around 1891, Frege revised his semantics. This revision solves a number of problems that the earlier, monistic account is not able to handle without further expansion. According to Frege's mature account, each expression has a sense ("Sinn"), which contains a unique way in which the object (or function) that the expression stands for is given to us. The sense is a way an object is determined by an expression . (Roughly, "sense" in Frege's 1891 account resembles a way an object is determined by an expression in his earlier account.) The object or function that the expression stands for is the expression's significance ("Bedeutung"), also called "reference" or "referent" both in English translations of Frege's work and in Anglo-Saxon Frege scholarship. It follows that for each particular sense there can be maximally one significance/reference, while numerous distinct senses may correspond to the same significance, representing the various ways the object (or concept) that an expression stands for can be uniquely given to us in thought. For Frege, not only proper names but also concept words and relational expressions possess sense and significance. Their significance then is a concept or relation, not an object, and their sense – though Frege does not say much about it – presumably consists in a logical thought component that contains the necessary and sufficient conditions for an object to fall under the concept (or stand in the relation to another object). Finally, the sense of a complete sentence is a thought, and its significance a truth-value.

Although the terms "Sinn" and "Bedeutung" appear already in Foundations of 1884, the distinction itself and the semantic account connected with it do not occur in Frege's writings before 1891.  Part of that distinction is a logical bifurcation of what Frege earlier calls the "judgable content" into a truth-value and a thought as the truth-value bearer. At the same time, the new account classifies ways an object is given as logical components of thoughts, while the relation between ways an object can be determined according to his earlier account to the judgable contents of which it is a logical component had never been clarified. Thus, the new account appears more consistent and complete with regard to the question of how semantic wholes are composed of their parts. On both levels, that of sense and that of significance, wholes are conceived of as functionally composite units that depend on the nature of their parts. On each level, moreover, the unit of a whole requires the supplement of a function by a suitable argument. A truth-value for Frege simply is the value of a concept or relation relative to certain arguments. Likewise, a thought is a composite of senses, at least one of which plays the part of a function and the other of its argument.

Furthermore, the new account opens up an approach to the semantics of fictional language, that is, it opens up an approach to sentences "about" fictional characters or locations. Such sentences typically contain thoughts that have no truth-value because one or the other of their logical components – senses of fictional terms – lacks a corresponding significance in terms of a real object (or concept). Frege's idea here is based on the dependence of truth-values on arguments and functions – the non-existence of an object corresponding to a specific sense amounts to the lack of an argument for the functional part of the sentence, and therefore leads to the lack of a value for that function in this case.

Also, the distinction between sense and significance allows for an expansion of Frege's semantics to belief ascriptions, that is, to sentences of the form "John believed that the earth is flat." The idea is that this sentence may be true independently of whether the embedded part of it ("the earth is flat") is true. But this means that -- since the truth-value of the entire sentence functionally depends on the significance of each part -- what the embedded part stands for cannot be a truth-value. Rather, Frege concludes that in the case of indirect speech and belief ascriptions, embedded sentences take on their original sense – the thought they normally express – as an indirect significance. Thus, while the thought they normally express is their sense in direct speech, it becomes their significance in indirect speech.

Finally, the distinction between sense and significance gives a more consistent account of the informative nature of certain kinds of identity statements (like "The evening star is the morning star") than Frege's earlier distinction between what is designated by a name and the way it is determined by means of the name. By introducing this new distinction, Frege no longer needs to regard the concept (or relation) of identity as having the peculiar feature of taking on names rather than objects themselves as its arguments. Thus, within his mature semantics, identity once again becomes an ontological relation in which each object stands to itself (though this has been recently disputed in Caplan & Thau 2001). Identity statements no longer are conceived as being about the fact that two different names have the same conceptual content but rather about the fact that the object given to us in one particular way is the same as the object given in another. The idea is similar to Frege's early solution to the puzzle of informative identity statements: some identity statements are informative insofar as they state that an object determined or given to us in one way is the same as an object determined or given to us in some other way. However, how this idea is theoretically applied and connected to a general account of semantic content appears more consistent in Frege's later semantics than in his earlier one.

c. Some Issues of Translation

There have been a number of suggestions as to how to translate "Bedeutung" as opposed to "Sinn" in later Frege into English. Besides "meaning", which in 1970 was officially chosen as the standard translation in all Blackwell editions of Frege's works because of its exegetical neutrality (see Beaney 1997: 36, n. 84), the two main other alternatives that have been proposed are "reference" and "significance", by Dummett and Tugendhat, respectively. Dummett also suggests that we distinguish between "reference" for the relation between an expression and the object it refers to and "referent" for this object itself (1981a:93f.). The term "meaning", by contrast, is problematic as a translation for "Bedeutung" because meaning often is taken to be either something like sense – that is, the thought connected to a sentence in our minds – or something like the rules of use for an expression in any given context: but none of this is what Frege had in mind when he spoke of "Bedeutung".

Tugendhat's proposal to translate "Bedeutung" in Frege as "significance" is based on the insight that, while "reference" or "referent" may be regarded as an adequate rendering of "Bedeutung" in the case of proper names, it is quite misleading in that of predicate expressions (Tugendhat 1970:177; cp.. Dummett 1981a:182f.). Indeed, Frege himself points out that in the case of concepts we could not properly speak about the "Bedeutung" – in the sense of "referent" – of the expression, since then we would imply that we were talking about an object, which cannot be the case in light of Frege's distinction between objects and concepts (1997: 177, 365). Thus, rendering "Bedeutung" always as "reference" or "referent" would in fact require us to introduce some general notion of "entity", which comprises both concepts and objects in order to explain just what  "Bedeutung" in general is. However, Frege obviously never saw any need for such a general, all-embracing ontological category like "entity".

Dummett admits that besides the idea of the name-bearer relation, which he regarded as Frege's prototype relation of reference, a secondary aspect of reference must be acknowledged as well, which consists in the semantic role of the respective expression, that is, in its contribution the truth-values of sentences in which it may occur (1981a:190f.). On this view, predicate expressions behave like proper names in having the function of contributing to the truth-values of sentences in which they occur by means of their respective references, though their semantic role is different from that of proper names. However, Tugendhat (1970) claims that "Bedeutung" in Frege should be understood to always mean primarily the semantic role of an expression, that is, its truth-value potential, and precisely for this reason "Bedeutung" should be translated as "significance" or "importance". The main evidence in favor of this interpretation is that, for Frege, which reference an expression has, and whether it has any at all, is logically significant only for determining the truth-values of the sentences in which it may occur (as well as whether they have a truth-value at all). Thus, for Tugendhat, there appears to be no additional aspect of the reference of proper names that would justify regarding it as the "prototype" semantic relation, that is, as somewhat superior to the relation between predicates and the concepts or relations that they stand for.

Unlike "reference", "significance" as a candidate translation for Fregean "Bedeutung" has the advantage that it is generally accepted as a regular connotative aspect of the various meanings of "Bedeutung" in standard German usage, and that it is explicitly used in this meaning by Frege himself (1997:80; cp.. Gabriel 1984:192). Moreover, it seems to be supported by an important principle that Frege endorses, namely, the so-called context principle.

d. The Context Principle and the Priority of Judgments over Concepts

According to the context principle, which is most explicitly stated in Foundations – though nowhere called "context principle" by Frege himself – the sense and/or significance of a word cannot be explained or inquired after in isolation but only in the context of a proposition/sentence (1984: x, §106). It has been a matter of scholarly dispute whether Frege understood this principle to be about sense, or about significance, or about both, since at the time of Foundations the distinction between the two had not been made yet. There has also been a long debate about what exactly the principle implies and how it is to be understood, especially since in one of its formulations, Frege goes so far as to state that a word possesses sense and/or significance only in the context of a sentence (ibid., §62). In fact, this latter formulation has received the most attention in the secondary literature, leading to a widespread conviction that Frege proposes a principle of semantic holism.

However, some scholars, including Dummett, claim that Frege drops the principle in his later writings while others argue that there are passages even in later writings where Frege seems to articulate semantic or non-semantic versions of it in the light of the distinction between sense and significance. For instance, in "Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter," Frege points out that one comes at the parts of a thought only by analyzing the whole – which may be taken as a version of the context principle as a holistic principle at the level of sense (1997:362). It is also conceivable to regard the context principle, as some scholars have, as a semantic version of what has been called the "principle of priority of judgments over concepts" (see Bell 1979, Sluga 1980), which figures in Frege's very early writings composed before Foundations. According to this latter principle, which Frege explicitly presents as a novel principle in the history of logic, the judgment and its content are to be regarded as logically primitive while concepts, as components of judgable contents in Frege's early account, are derivative logical entities that can be isolated only by analysis of judgable contents (1979:17, 1983:19). In this respect, Frege is thought to deviate from traditional Aristotelian logic much further than logicians of his time or earlier, who tend to naively presuppose the concepts required to create judgable contents as independently given.

Be that as it may, Tugendhat's claim is that the context principle was an early statement by Frege that points to his conception of "Bedeutung" as truth-value potential and thus to "significance" as the most basic and general meaning of that term (1970:182; cp.. Gabriel 1984:189ff.). It is clear from this that he believed Frege to have held the context principle as a principle about the dependency of significance on truth-value, that is, on what is characteristically denoted only by sentences. For why should a word have significance only in the context of a sentence if not for the reason that its significance simply consists in a truth-value potential, and that sentences are the only kind of expressions considered as true or false? From this it naturally follows that the question of whether an expression has significance can only arise in connection with the question of whether a sentence is true or false. And this idea indeed is used extensively in Frege's later writings, especially in the context of his distinction between the realms of  art and science (1997:157). "Bedeutung" in this sense is a purely normative term always directed towards an aim or value. And what Frege appears to focus on in "On Sense and Reference" is the question relative to what value or aim the relation of proper names to the objects they stand for - that is, their reference in Dummett's terminology - is significant: namely, relative to the scientific value of truth alone, and this is a value that only sentences can have.

However, one should note that the context principle has been perceived to clash with another principle commonly assigned to Frege, namely, that of the principle of functionality or compositionality. According to this principle, as it has been interpreted by some scholars, the senses of sentences are ultimately made up of atomic building blocks. According to this interpretation, then, Frege was an atomist and not a holist about meaning components; and this view -- though irreconcilable with the context principle, at least as it has been commonly understood -- would support Dummett's interpretation of the reference relation between names and objects as the paradigm relation of logical semantics. (For a detailed critical overview and discussion of the debate about the context principle and the principle of compositionality in Frege see Pelletier 2000).

4. References and Further Reading

a. Frege's Writings

  • 1879. Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens, Halle: L. Niebert; reprinted in Frege 1998a; trans. as "Begriffsschrift, a Formula Language, Modeled upon that of Arithmetic, for Pure Thought" in From Frege to Gödel, edited by J. van Heijenoort, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press 1967, and as "Conceptual Notation" in Frege 1972; selections in Frege 1997.
  • 1879-1891: "Logik", in Frege 1983: 1-8; trans. as "Logic" in Frege 1979: 1-8.
  • 1880/1: "Booles rechnende Logik und meine Begriffsschrift", in Frege 1983: 9-52; trans. As "Boole's Logical Calculus and the Concept-Script", in Frege 1979: 9-46.
  • 1882: "Über die wissenschaftliche Berechtigung einer Begriffsschrift", in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 81: 48-56; repr. in Frege 1998: 106-14; trans. as "On the Scientific Justification of a Begriffsschrift", in Frege 1972: 83-89.
  • 1884: Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, Breslau: W. Koebner; reprinted with an introduction and afterword by J. Schulte, Stuttgart: Reclam 1987; trans. by J. L. Austin as The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number in Frege 1953; selections in Frege 1997.
  • 1891a: "Funktion und Begriff", Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1891; reprinted in Frege 1990: 125-42; trans. as "Function and Concept" in Frege 1984: 137-56, in Frege 1952: 21-41, and in Frege 1997:130-48.
  • 1891b: "Über das Trägheitsgesetz", in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 98: 145-61; reprinted in Frege 1990: 113-24; trans. as "On the Law of Inertia" in Frege 1984: 123-36.
  • 1891c: Letter to Husserl of 5/24/1891, in Frege 1976: 94-98; trans. in Frege 1980: 61-64.
  • 1892a: "Über Sinn und Bedeutung", in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100: 25-50; reprinted in Frege 1990: 143-62; trans. as "On Sense and Meaning" Frege 1984: 157-77, as "On Sinn and Bedeutung" in Frege 1997: 151-71, and as "On Sense and Reference" in Frege 1952: 56-78.
  • 1892b: "Über Begriff und Gegenstand", in Vierteljahresschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 16: 192-205, reprinted in Frege 1990: 167-178; trans. as "On Concept and Object" in Frege 1980: 182-94, in Frege 1952: 42-55, and in Frege 1997: 181-93.
  • 1892-95: "Ausführungen über Sinn und Bedeutung", in Frege 1983: 128-36; trans. as "Comments on Sense and Meaning" in Frege 1979: 118-25, and as "Comments on Sinn and Bedeutung" in Frege 1997: 172-80.
  • 1893: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, vol. I, Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle; reprinted in Frege 1998b; incomplete translation in Frege 1982.
  • 1903: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, vol. II, Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle; reprinted in Frege 1998b; trans. in Frege 1982.
  • 1906a: "Einleitung in die Logik", in Frege 1983: 201-18; trans. as "Introduction to Logic" in Frege 1979: 185-96, and in Frege 1997: 293-8.
  • 1906b: "Brief an Husserl, 9.12.1906", in Frege 1976: 105-6; trans. in Frege 1997: 305-307.
  • 1914: "Logik in der Mathematik" in Frege 1983: 219-70; trans. as "Logic in Mathematics" in Frege 1979: 203-50.
  • 1918: "Der Gedanke", in Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 58-77, reprinted in Frege 1990: 342-78; trans. as "Thoughts" in Frege 1984: 351-72, and as "Thought" in Frege 1997: 325-45.
  • 1919a: "Die Verneinung", in Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-19): 143-57, reprinted in Frege 1990: 362-78; trans. as "Negation" in Frege 1984: 373-89 and in Frege 1997: 346-61.
  • 1919b: "Aufzeichnungen für Ludwig Darmstaedter" in Frege 1983: 273-77; trans. as "Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter" in Frege 1979: 253-57, and in Frege 1997: 362-7.
  • 1924/5: "Erkenntnisquellen der Mathematik und der mathematischen Naturwissenschaften", in Frege 1983: 286-294; trans. as "Sources of Knowledge of Mathematics and the Mathematical Natural Sciences" in Frege 1979: 267-274.
  • 1952: Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, ed. by: Geach and M. Black, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1953: The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number/Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1972: Conceptual Notation and Related Articles, ed. by T. W. Bynum. London: Oxford University Press.
  • 1976: Wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag; trans. as Frege 1980.
  • 1979: Posthumous Writings, trans. by: Long and R. White, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1980: Philosophical and Mathematical Correspondence, trans. by H. Kaal, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1982: The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, ed. and trans. by Montgomery Furth, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • 1983: Nachgelassene Schriften, ed. by H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, F. Kaulbach, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag (2nd ed.).
  • 1984: Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic and Philosophy, trans. by M. Black, V. Dudman: Geach, H. Kaal, E.-H. W. Kluge, B. McGuinness, and R. H. Stoothoff, New York: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1990: Kleine Schriften, ed. by I. Angelelli, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd ed.); trans. as Frege 1984.
  • 1997: The Frege Reader, ed. M. Beaney, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1998a: Begriffsschrift und andere Aufsätze, ed. by I. Angelelli, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd ed. reprint); trans. by T. W. Bynum as Frege 1972.
  • 1998b: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik I/II, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd reprint of the 1893/1903 editions); trans. as Frege 1982.

b. Other Recommended Literature

i. General Introductions and Companions to Frege's Work

  • Baker, G.P. and P.M. S. Hacker, 1984, Frege: Logical Excavations, New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Comprehensive introduction to and critique of Frege’s work from a Wittgensteinian perspective; takes issue especially with Dummett’s interpretation of Frege.
  • Beaney, Michael, 1997: "Introduction" in Frege 1997: 1-46.
    • Good and concise introduction to both Frege’s work and the state of Frege scholarship at the time.
  • Bynum, Terrell W., 1972: "On the Life and Work of Gottlob Frege", in Frege 1972: 1-54.
    • Good first source of information on Frege, including biographical information about his life and career.
  • Currie, Gregory, 1982, Frege: An Introduction to His Philosophy, Sussex: Harvester Press.
    • Good and well-written general introduction to Frege’s work with emphasis on his epistemological and ontological views and his indebtedness to the Kantian tradition.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1978: "Frege's Philosophy", in Dummett, M., Truth and Other Enigmas, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press; earlier version published in the Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Volume 3), ed. Edwards, New York: MacMillan, 1967.
    • One of the first attempts to locate Frege's place within the history of philosophy; good as a very first orientation but opinionated and no longer generally accepted.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1981b, The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Is a follow-up to Dummett’s Frege: Philosophy of Language and contains extensive discussions of and defense against Sluga’s critique of that book.
  • Gabriel, Gottfried and Uwe Dathe (eds.), 2000, Gottlob Frege: Werk und Wirkung, Paderborn: Mentis Verlag.
    • In German; contains historical assessments of Frege's work and influence on 20th century philosophy on occasion of his 150th birthday; also contains his hitherto unpublished proposals for a reform of the Germanelection law.)
  • George, Alexander and Richard Heck (1998, 2003): "Frege, Gottlob", In E. Craig (ed.), Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, London: Routledge.
    • Very concise; good to get a very first overview over Frege’s work, especially in the philosophy of logic and mathematics.
  • Haaparanta, Leila and Jaakko Hintikka (eds.), 1986, Frege Synthesized. Boston: D. Reidel
    • Contains specialized articles on various aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Ricketts, Thomas G. (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Frege, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming.
    • Contains scholarly articles on all the main aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Schirn, Matthias (ed.), 1976, Studien zu Frege, 3 vols., Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Verlag Frommann-Holzboog.
    • Contains various scholarly interpretations of the core aspects of Frege’s work; articles in German and English.
  • Schirn, Matthias (ed.), 1996, Frege – Importance and Legacy, Berlin-New York: DeGruyter.
    • Contains further scholarly interpretations of the core aspects of Frege’s work.
  • Sluga, Hans, 1980, Gottlob Frege, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Comprehensive historical introduction; lays emphasis on the historical roots and background of Frege’s thought in 19th century German philosophy, especially Lotze; good to gain a comprehensive picture of the original historical setting of Frege’s thought.
  • Sluga, Hans (ed.), 1993, The Philosophy of Frege, 4 vols., New York: Garland Publishing.
    • Contains specialist papers on various aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Weiner, Joan, 1999, Frege (Past Masters), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Brief and concise; good as first introduction.
  • Weiner, Joan, 2004, Frege Explained, Open Court Publishing.
    • Even briefer; good as first introduction.
  • Wright, Crispin (ed.), 1984, Frege: Tradition and Influence, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
    • Contains specialist papers on various aspects of Frege’s thought.

ii. General Introductions to the Philosophy of Language

  • Devitt, Michael and Kim Sterelny, 1999, Language and Reality: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Language, 2nd edition, The MIT Press.
    • Decent introduction to the philosophy of language from a naturalistic point of view; may presuppose some familiarity with ‘analytic’ terminology.
  • Lycan, William, 2000, Philosophy of Language, London/New York: Routledge.
    • Good overview over the various problems and theories in 20th century analytic philosophy of language; includes questions for discussion and further references; does not presuppose particular familiarity with analytic terminology.
  • Nye, Andrea, 1998 (ed.), Philosophy of Language: The Big Questions, London: Basil Blackwell.
    • Comprehensive anthology of text fragments from various sources with introductory essays by the editor.

iii. On (Various Aspects of) Frege’s Philosophy of Language

  • Beaney, Michael, 1996, Frege: Making Sense. London: Duckworth.
  • Bell, David, 1979, Frege's Theory of Judgment, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1979: "Sinning against Frege", The Philosophical Review 88: 398-432.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1986: "Frege on Truth", in Haaparanta/Hintikka 1986.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1990: "Frege on Sense and Linguistic Meaning", in Bell/Cooper 1990.
  • Caplan, Ben & Mike Thau, 2001: "What's Puzzling Gottlob Frege?", Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31, 2: 159-200.
  • Carl, Wolfgang, 1994, Frege's Theory of Sense and Reference, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1981a, Frege: Philosophy of Language, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (2nd ed.).
  • Gabriel, Gottfried, 1984: "Fregean Connection: Bedeutung, Value and Truth-Value", in Wright 1984.
  • Greimann, Dirk, 2003, Freges Konzeption der Wahrheit, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag.
  • Pelletier, Francis Jeffry, 2000: "Did Frege Believe Frege's Principle?" Journal of Logic, Language, and Information 10: 87-114.
  • Sluga, Hans, 2002: "Frege on Truth", in Reck 2002.
  • Tugendhat, Ernst 1970: "The Meaning of "Bedeutung" in Frege", Analysis 30: 177-189.

iv. Other Philosophy of Language Relevant to or Referenced in this Article

  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1956, Meaning and Necessity, Chicago: University of Chicago Press (2nd ed.).
  • Grice, Paul, 1989, Studies in the Ways of Words, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1905: "On Denoting", Mind 14: 479-93; reprinted in Russell, B., 1956, Logic and Knowledge, London.
  • Searle, John, 1969, Speech Acts: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

v. Some Specialized Literature on the Epistemological Dimensions of Frege’s Thought

  • Burge, Tyler, 1992: "Frege on Knowing the Third Realm", Mind 101: 633-650.
  • Carl, Wolfgang, 1994, Frege's Theory of Sense and Reference, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lotter, Dorothea, 2004, Logik und Vernunft: Freges Rationalismus im Kontext seiner Zeit, Freiburg: Karl Alber Verlag.
  • Weiner, Joan, 1990, Frege in Perspective, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

vi. General Contributions and Companions to the History of Early Analytic Philosophy

  • Bell, David and Neil Cooper (eds.), 1990, The Analytic Tradition, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Coffa, Alberto, 1991, The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap to the Vienna Station, L. Wessels (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1991a, Frege and Other Philosophers, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1993, The Origins of Analytical Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Reck, Erich (ed.), 2002, From Frege to Wittgenstein: Perspectives on Early Analytic Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Tait, William W. (ed.), 1997, Early Analytic Philosophy: Essays in Honor of Leonard Linsky, La Salle.

vii. Literature on Other Aspects of Frege's Philosophy

  • Dummett, Michael, 1991b, Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, London: Duckworth; repr. 1995.
  • Linnebo, Øystein, 2003: "Frege's Conception of Logic: From Kant to the Grundgesetze", Manuscrito 26: 2 (2003), 235-252.
  • Van Heijenoort, Jean, 1967: "Logic as Calculus and Logic as Language", Synthese 17, 324–330.

viii. Other Literature Referenced in this Article

  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1928a, Der Logische Aufbau der Welt, Berlin: Weltkreis Verlag; trans. by Rolf A. George as The Logical Structure of the World, in Carnap 2003.
  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1928b, Scheinprobleme in der Philosophie, Berlin: Weltkreis Verlag; trans. by Rolf A. George as Pseudoproblems in Philosophy in Carnap 2003.
  • Carnap, Rudolph, 2003, The Logical Structure of the World/Pseudoproblems in Philosophy, Open Court Publishing.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1951, The Structure of Appearance, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1963: "The Significance of Carnap's Der logische Aufbau der Welt," in Schilpp 1963.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1655, De Corpore, Part I: Computatio Sive Logica, tr. by A. Martinich as Logic, New York: Abaris 1981.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1781/1786, Kritik der reinen Vernunft, Riga: Johann Friedrich Hartknoch, 1st edition (A), 1781; 2nd edition (B), 1787; ed. and transl. by: Guyer and A. Wood as Critique of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1997.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, 1704/1765, Nouveaux Essais Sur L'Entendement Humain, ed. and trans. as New Essays on the Human Understanding by: Remnant and J. Bennett, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1981.
  • Locke, John, 1690, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, ed. by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press 1975.
  • Trendelenburg, Friedrich Adolf, 1867: "Über Leibnizens Entwurf einer allgemeinen Charakteristik", Historische Beiträge zur Philosophie, vol. III, Berlin.

c. Related Articles

Author Information

Dorothea Lotter
U. S. A.

Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889—1951)

Ludwig WittgensteinLudwig Wittgenstein is one of the most influential philosophers of the twentieth century, and regarded by some as the most important since Immanuel Kant. His early work was influenced by that of Arthur Schopenhauer and, especially, by his teacher Bertrand Russell and by Gottlob Frege, who became something of a friend. This work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, the only philosophy book that Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. It claimed to solve all the major problems of philosophy and was held in especially high esteem by the anti-metaphysical logical positivists. The Tractatus is based on the idea that philosophical problems arise from misunderstandings of the logic of language, and it tries to show what this logic is. Wittgenstein's later work, principally his Philosophical Investigations, shares this concern with logic and language, but takes a different, less technical, approach to philosophical problems. This book helped to inspire so-called ordinary language philosophy. This style of doing philosophy has fallen somewhat out of favor, but Wittgenstein's work on rule-following and private language is still considered important, and his later philosophy is influential in a growing number of fields outside philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus
  3. Ethics and Religion
  4. Conception of Philosophy
  5. Meaning
  6. Rules and Private Language
  7. Realism and Anti-Realism
  8. Certainty
  9. Continuity
  10. Wittgenstein in History
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Wittgenstein’s Main Works
    2. Some Biographies of Wittgenstein
    3. Secondary Works

1. Life

Ludwig Josef Johann Wittgenstein, born on April 26th 1889 in Vienna, Austria, was a charismatic enigma. He has been something of a cult figure but shunned publicity and even built an isolated hut in Norway to live in complete seclusion. His sexuality was ambiguous but he was probably gay; how actively so is still a matter of controversy. His life seems to have been dominated by an obsession with moral and philosophical perfection, summed up in the subtitle of Ray Monk's excellent biography Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius.

His concern with moral perfection led Wittgenstein at one point to insist on confessing to several people various sins, including that of allowing others to underestimate the extent of his 'Jewishness'. His father Karl Wittgenstein's parents were born Jewish but converted to Protestantism and his mother Leopoldine (nee Kalmus) was Catholic, but her father was of Jewish descent. Wittgenstein himself was baptized in a Catholic church and was given a Catholic burial, although between baptism and burial he was neither a practicing nor a believing Catholic.

The Wittgenstein family was large and wealthy. Karl Wittgenstein was one of the most successful businessmen in the Austro-Hungarian Empire, leading the iron and steel industry there. The Wittgensteins' home attracted people of culture, especially musicians, including the composer Johannes Brahms, who was a friend of the family. Music remained important to Wittgenstein throughout his life. So did darker matters. Ludwig was the youngest of eight children, and of his four brothers, three committed suicide.

As for his career, Wittgenstein studied mechanical engineering in Berlin and in 1908 went to Manchester, England to do research in aeronautics, experimenting with kites. His interest in engineering led to an interest in mathematics which in turn got him thinking about philosophical questions about the foundations of mathematics. He visited the mathematician and philosopher Gottlob Frege (1848-1925), who recommended that he study with Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) in Cambridge. At Cambridge Wittgenstein greatly impressed Russell and G.E. Moore (1873- 1958), and began work on logic.

When his father died in 1913 Wittgenstein inherited a fortune, which he quickly gave away. When war broke out the next year, he volunteered for the Austrian army. He continued his philosophical work and won several medals for bravery during the war. The result of his thinking on logic was the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus which was eventually published in English in 1922 with Russell's help. This was the only book Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. Having thus, in his opinion, solved all the problems of philosophy, Wittgenstein became an elementary school teacher in rural Austria, where his approach was strict and unpopular, but apparently effective. He spent 1926-28 meticulously designing and building an austere house in Vienna for his sister Gretl.

In 1929 he returned to Cambridge to teach at Trinity College, recognizing that in fact he had more work to do in philosophy. He became professor of philosophy at Cambridge in 1939. During World War II he worked as a hospital porter in London and as a research technician in Newcastle. After the war he returned to university teaching but resigned his professorship in 1947 to concentrate on writing. Much of this he did in Ireland, preferring isolated rural places for his work. By 1949 he had written all the material that was published after his death as Philosophical Investigations, arguably his most important work. He spent the last two years of his life in Vienna, Oxford and Cambridge and kept working until he died of prostate cancer in Cambridge in April 1951. His work from these last years has been published as On Certainty. His last words were, "Tell them I've had a wonderful life."

2. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus

Wittgenstein told Ludwig von Ficker that the point of the Tractatus was ethical. In the preface to the book he says that its value consists in two things: "that thoughts are expressed in it" and "that it shows how little is achieved when these problems are solved." The problems he refers to are the problems of philosophy defined, we may suppose, by the work of Frege and Russell, and perhaps also Schopenhauer. At the end of the book Wittgenstein says "My propositions serve as elucidations in the following way: anyone who understands me eventually recognizes them as nonsensical" [emphasis added]. What to make of the Tractatus, its author, and the propositions it contains, then, is no easy matter.

The book certainly does not seem to be about ethics. It consists of numbered propositions in seven sets. Proposition 1.2 belongs to the first set and is a comment on proposition 1. Proposition 1.21 is about proposition 1.2, and so on. The seventh set contains only one proposition, the famous "What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence."

Some important and representative propositions from the book are these:

1 The world is all that is the case.
4.01 A proposition is a picture of reality.
4.0312 ...My fundamental idea is that the 'logical constants' are not representatives; that there can be no representatives of the logic of facts.
4.121 ...Propositions show the logical form of reality. They display it.
4.1212 What can be shown, cannot be said.
4.5 ...The general form of a proposition is: This is how things stand.
5.43 ...all the propositions of logic say the same thing, to wit nothing.
5.4711 To give the essence of a proposition means to give the essence of all description, and thus the essence of the world.
5.6 The limits of my language mean the limits of my world.

Here and elsewhere in the Tractatus Wittgenstein seems to be saying that the essence of the world and of life is: This is how things are. One is tempted to add "--deal with it." That seems to fit what Cora Diamond has called his "accept and endure" ethics, but he says that the propositions of the Tractatus are meaningless, not profound insights, ethical or otherwise. What are we to make of this?

Many commentators ignore or dismiss what Wittgenstein said about his work and its aims, and instead look for regular philosophical theories in his work. The most famous of these in the Tractatus is the "picture theory" of meaning. According to this theory propositions are meaningful insofar as they picture states of affairs or matters of empirical fact. Anything normative, supernatural or (one might say) metaphysical must, it therefore seems, be nonsense. This has been an influential reading of parts of the Tractatus. Unfortunately, this reading leads to serious problems since by its own lights the Tractatus' use of words like "object," "reality" and "world" is illegitimate. These concepts are purely formal or a priori. A statement such as "There are objects in the world" does not picture a state of affairs. Rather it is, as it were, presupposed by the notion of a state of affairs. The "picture theory" therefore denies sense to just the kind of statements of which the Tractatus is composed, to the framework supporting the picture theory itself. In this way the Tractatus pulls the rug out from under its own feet.

If the propositions of the Tractatus are nonsensical then they surely cannot put forward the picture theory of meaning, or any other theory. Nonsense is nonsense. However, this is not to say that the Tractatus itself is without value. Wittgenstein's aim seems to have been to show up as nonsense the things that philosophers (himself included) are tempted to say. Philosophical theories, he suggests, are attempts to answer questions that are not really questions at all (they are nonsense), or to solve problems that are not really problems. He says in proposition 4.003 that:

Most of the propositions and questions of philosophers arise from our failure to understand the logic of our language. (They belong to the same class as the question whether the good is more or less identical than the beautiful.) And it is not surprising that the deepest problems are in fact not problems at all.

Philosophers, then, have the task of presenting the logic of our language clearly. This will not solve important problems but it will show that some things that we take to be important problems are really not problems at all. The gain is not wisdom but an absence of confusion. This is not a rejection of philosophy or logic. Wittgenstein took philosophical puzzlement very seriously indeed, but he thought that it needed dissolving by analysis rather than solving by the production of theories. The Tractatus presents itself as a key for untying a series of knots both profound and highly technical.

3. Ethics and Religion

Wittgenstein had a lifelong interest in religion and claimed to see every problem from a religious point of view, but never committed himself to any formal religion. His various remarks on ethics also suggest a particular point of view, and Wittgenstein often spoke of ethics and religion together. This point of view or attitude can be seen in the four main themes that run through Wittgenstein's writings on ethics and religion: goodness, value or meaning are not to be found in the world; living the right way involves acceptance of or agreement with the world, or life, or God's will, or fate; one who lives this way will see the world as a miracle; there is no answer to the problem of life--the solution is the disappearance of the problem.

Certainly Wittgenstein worried about being morally good or even perfect, and he had great respect for sincere religious conviction, but he also said, in his 1929 lecture on ethics, that "the tendency of all men who ever tried to write or talk Ethics or Religion was to run against the boundaries of language," i.e. to talk or write nonsense. This gives support to the view that Wittgenstein believed in mystical truths that somehow cannot be expressed meaningfully but that are of the utmost importance. It is hard to conceive, though, what these 'truths' might be.

An alternative view is that Wittgenstein believed that there is really nothing to say about ethics. This would explain why he wrote less and less about ethics as his life wore on. His "accept and endure" attitude and belief in going "the bloody hard way" are evident in all his work, especially after the Tractatus. Wittgenstein wants his reader not to think (too much) but to look at the "language games" (any practices that involve language) that give rise to philosophical (personal, existential, spiritual) problems. His approach to such problems is painstaking, thorough, open-eyed and receptive. His ethical attitude is an integral part of his method and shows itself as such.

But there is little to say about such an attitude short of recommending it. In Culture and Value p.29e Wittgenstein writes:

Rules of life are dressed up in pictures. And these pictures can only serve to describe what we are to do, not justify it. Because they could provide a justification only if they held good in other respects as well. I can say: "Thank these bees for their honey as though they were kind people who have prepared it for you"; that is intelligible and describes how I should like you to conduct yourself. But I cannot say: "Thank them because, look, how kind they are!"--since the next moment they may sting you.

In a world of contingency one cannot prove that a particular attitude is the correct one to take. If this suggests relativism, it should be remembered that it too is just one more attitude or point of view, and one without the rich tradition and accumulated wisdom, philosophical reasoning and personal experience of, say, orthodox Christianity or Judaism. Indeed crude relativism, the universal judgement that one cannot make universal judgements, is self- contradictory. Whether Wittgenstein's views suggest a more sophisticated form of relativism is another matter, but the spirit of relativism seems far from Wittgenstein's conservatism and absolute intolerance of his own moral shortcomings. Compare the tolerance that motivates relativism with Wittgenstein's assertion to Russell that he would prefer "by far" an organization dedicated to war and slavery to one dedicated to peace and freedom. (This assertion, however, should not be taken literally: Wittgenstein was no war-monger and even recommended letting oneself be massacred rather than taking part in hand-to-hand combat. It was apparently the complacency, and perhaps the self-righteousness, of Russell's liberal cause that Wittgenstein objected to.)

With regard to religion, Wittgenstein is often considered a kind of Anti-Realist (see below for more on this). He opposed interpretations of religion that emphasize doctrine or philosophical arguments intended to prove God's existence, but was greatly drawn to religious rituals and symbols, and considered becoming a priest. He likened the ritual of religion to a great gesture, as when one kisses a photograph. This is not based on the false belief that the person in the photograph will feel the kiss or return it, nor is it based on any other belief. Neither is the kiss just a substitute for a particular phrase, like "I love you." Like the kiss, religious activity does express an attitude, but it is not just the expression of an attitude in the sense that several other forms of expression might do just as well. There might be no substitute that would do. The same might be said of the whole language-game (or games) of religion, but this is a controversial point. If religious utterances, such as "God exists," are treated as gestures of a certain kind then this seems not to be treating them as literal statements. Many religious believers, including Wittgensteinian ones, would object strongly to this. There is room, though, for a good deal of sophisticated disagreement about what it means to take a statement literally. For instance, Charles Taylor's view, roughly, is that the real is whatever will not go away. If we cannot reduce talk about God to anything else, or replace it, or prove it false, then perhaps God is as real as anything else.

4. Conception of Philosophy

Wittgenstein's view of what philosophy is, or should be, changed little over his life. In the Tractatus he says at 4.111 that "philosophy is not one of the natural sciences," and at 4.112 "Philosophy aims at the logical clarification of thoughts." Philosophy is not descriptive but elucidatory. Its aim is to clear up muddle and confusion. It follows that philosophers should not concern themselves so much with what is actual, keeping up with the latest popularizations of science, say, which Wittgenstein despised. The philosopher's proper concern is with what is possible, or rather with what is conceivable. This depends on our concepts and the ways they fit together as seen in language. What is conceivable and what is not, what makes sense and what does not, depends on the rules of language, of grammar.

In Philosophical Investigations Sect. 90 Wittgenstein says:

Our investigation is a grammatical one. Such an investigation sheds light on our problem by clearing misunderstandings away. Misunderstandings concerning the use of words, caused, among other things, by certain analogies between the forms of expression in different regions of language.

The similarities between the sentences "I'll keep it in mind" and "I'll keep it in this box," for instance, (along with many others) can lead one to think of the mind as a thing something like a box with contents of its own. The nature of this box and its mental contents can then seem very mysterious. Wittgenstein suggests that one way, at least, to deal with such mysteries is to recall the different things one says about minds, memories, thoughts and so on, in a variety of contexts.

What one says, or what people in general say, can change. Ways of life and uses of language change, so meanings change, but not utterly and instantaneously. Things shift and evolve, but rarely if ever so drastically that we lose all grip on meaning. So there is no timeless essence of at least some and perhaps all concepts, but we still understand one another well enough most of the time.

When nonsense is spoken or written, or when something just seems fishy, we can sniff it out. The road out of confusion can be a long and difficult one, hence the need for constant attention to detail and particular examples rather than generalizations, which tend to be vague and therefore potentially misleading. The slower the route, the surer the safety at the end of it. That is why Wittgenstein said that in philosophy the winner is the one who finishes last. But we cannot escape language or the confusions to which it gives rise, except by dying. In the meantime, Wittgenstein offers four main methods to avoid philosophical confusion, as described by Norman Malcolm: describing circumstances in which a seemingly problematic expression might actually be used in everyday life, comparing our use of words with imaginary language games, imagining fictitious natural history, and explaining psychologically the temptation to use a certain expression inappropriately.

The complex, intertwined relationship between a language and the form of life that goes with it means that problems arising from language cannot just be set aside--they infect our lives, making us live in confusion. We might find our way back to the right path, but there is no guarantee that we will never again stray. In this sense there can be no progress in philosophy.

In 1931 Wittgenstein described his task thus:

Language sets everyone the same traps; it is an immense network of easily accessible wrong turnings. And so we watch one man after another walking down the same paths and we know in advance where he will branch off, where walk straight on without noticing the side turning, etc. etc. What I have to do then is erect signposts at all the junctions where there are wrong turnings so as to help people past the danger points.

But such signposts are all that philosophy can offer and there is no certainty that they will be noticed or followed correctly. And we should remember that a signpost belongs in the context of a particular problem area. It might be no help at all elsewhere, and should not be treated as dogma. So philosophy offers no truths, no theories, nothing exciting, but mainly reminders of what we all know. This is not a glamorous role, but it is difficult and important. It requires an almost infinite capacity for taking pains (which is one definition of genius) and could have enormous implications for anyone who is drawn to philosophical contemplation or who is misled by bad philosophical theories. This applies not only to professional philosophers but to any people who stray into philosophical confusion, perhaps not even realizing that their problems are philosophical and not, say, scientific.

5. Meaning

Sect. 43 of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations says that: "For a large class of cases--though not for all--in which we employ the word "meaning" it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language."

It is quite clear that here Wittgenstein is not offering the general theory that "meaning is use," as he is sometimes interpreted as doing. The main rival views that Wittgenstein warns against are that the meaning of a word is some object that it names--in which case the meaning of a word could be destroyed, stolen or locked away, which is nonsense--and that the meaning of a word is some psychological feeling--in which case each user of a word could mean something different by it, having a different feeling, and communication would be difficult if not impossible.

Knowing the meaning of a word can involve knowing many things: to what objects the word refers (if any), whether it is slang or not, what part of speech it is, whether it carries overtones, and if so what kind they are, and so on. To know all this, or to know enough to get by, is to know the use. And generally knowing the use means knowing the meaning. Philosophical questions about consciousness, for example, then, should be responded to by looking at the various uses we make of the word "consciousness." Scientific investigations into the brain are not directly relevant to this inquiry (although they might be indirectly relevant if scientific discoveries led us to change our use of such words). The meaning of any word is a matter of what we do with our language, not something hidden inside anyone's mind or brain. This is not an attack on neuroscience. It is merely distinguishing philosophy (which is properly concerned with linguistic or conceptual analysis) from science (which is concerned with discovering facts).

One exception to the meaning-is-use rule of thumb is given in Philosophical Investigations Sect.561, where Wittgenstein says that "the word "is" is used with two different meanings (as the copula and as the sign of equality)" but that its meaning is not its use. That is to say, "is" has not one complex use (including both "Water is clear" and "Water is H2O") and therefore one complex meaning, but two quite distinct uses and meanings. It is an accident that the same word has these two uses. It is not an accident that we use the word "car" to refer to both Fords and Hondas. But what is accidental and what is essential to a concept depends on us, on how we use it.

This is not completely arbitrary, however. Depending on one's environment, one's physical needs and desires, one's emotions, one's sensory capacities, and so on, different concepts will be more natural or useful to one. This is why "forms of life" are so important to Wittgenstein. What matters to you depends on how you live (and vice versa), and this shapes your experience. So if a lion could speak, Wittgenstein says, we would not be able to understand it. We might realize that "roar" meant zebra, or that "roar, roar" meant lame zebra, but we would not understand lion ethics, politics, aesthetic taste, religion, humor and such like, if lions have these things. We could not honestly say "I know what you mean" to a lion. Understanding another involves empathy, which requires the kind of similarity that we just do not have with lions, and that many people do not have with other human beings.

When a person says something what he or she means depends not only on what is said but also on the context in which it is said. Importance, point, meaning are given by the surroundings. Words, gestures, expressions come alive, as it were, only within a language game, a culture, a form of life. If a picture, say, means something then it means so to somebody. Its meaning is not an objective property of the picture in the way that its size and shape are. The same goes of any mental picture. Hence Wittgenstein's remark that "If God had looked into our minds he would not have been able to see there whom we were speaking of." Any internal image would need interpretation. If I interpret my thought as one of Hitler and God sees it as Charlie Chaplin, who is right? Which of the two famous contemporaries of Wittgenstein's I mean shows itself in the way I behave, the things I do and say. It is in this that the use, the meaning, of my thought or mental picture lies. "The arrow points only in the application that a living being makes of it."

6. Rules and Private Language

Without sharing certain attitudes towards the things around us, without sharing a sense of relevance and responding in similar ways, communication would be impossible. It is important, for instance, that nearly all of us agree nearly all the time on what colors things are. Such agreement is part of our concept of color, Wittgenstein suggests. Regularity of the use of such concepts and agreement in their application is part of language, not a logically necessary precondition of it. We cannot separate the life in which there is such agreement from our concept of color. Imagine a different form or way of life and you imagine a different language with different concepts, different rules and a different logic.

This raises the question of the relation between language and forms or ways of life. For instance, could just one person have a language of his or her own? To imagine an individual solitary from birth is scarcely to imagine a form of life at all, but more like just imagining a life- form. Moreover, language involves rules establishing certain linguistic practices. Rules of grammar express the fact that it is our practice to say this (e.g. "half past twelve") and not that (e.g. "half to one"). Agreement is essential to such practices. Could a solitary individual, then, engage in any practice, including linguistic ones? With whom could he or she agree? This is a controversial issue in the interpretation of Wittgenstein. Gordon Baker and P.M.S. Hacker hold that such a solitary man could speak his own language, follow his own rules, and so on, agreeing, over time, with himself in his judgements and behavior. Orthodoxy is against this interpretation, however.

Norman Malcolm has written that "If you conceive of an individual who has been in solitude his whole life long, then you have cut away the background of instruction, correction, acceptance--in short, the circumstances in which a rule is given, enforced, and followed." Mere regularity of behavior does not constitute following rules, whether they be rules of grammar or any other kind. A car that never starts in cold weather does not follow the rule "Don't start when it's cold," nor does a songbird follow a rule in singing the same song every day. Whether a solitary-from-birth individual would ever do anything that we would properly call following a rule is at least highly doubtful. How could he or she give himself or herself a rule to follow without language? And how could he or she get a language? Inventing one would involve inventing meaning, as Rush Rhees has argued, and this sounds incoherent. (The most famous debate about this was between Rhees and A.J. Ayer. Unfortunately for Wittgenstein, Ayer is generally considered to have won.) Alternatively, perhaps the Crusoe-like figure just does behave, sound, etc. just like a native speaker of, say, English. But this is to imagine either a freakish automaton, not a human being, or else a miracle. In the case of a miracle, Wittgenstein says, it is significant that we imagine not just the pseudo- Crusoe but also God. In the case of the automatic speaker, we might adopt what Daniel Dennett calls an "intentional stance" towards him, calling what he does "speaking English," but he is obviously not doing what the rest of us English-speakers--who learned the language, rather than being born speaking it, and who influence and are influenced by others in our use of the language--do.

The debate about solitary individuals is sometimes referred to as the debate about "private language." Wittgenstein uses this expression in another context, however, to name a language that refers to private sensations. Such a private language by definition cannot be understood by anyone other than its user (who alone knows the sensations to which it refers). Wittgenstein invites us to imagine a man who decides to write 'S' in his diary whenever he has a certain sensation. This sensation has no natural expression, and 'S' cannot be defined in words. The only judge of whether 'S' is used correctly is the inventor of 'S'. The only criterion of correctness is whether a sensation feels the same to him or her. There are no criteria for its being the same other than its seeming the same. So he writes 'S' when he feels like it. He might as well be doodling. The so-called 'private language' is no language at all. The point of this is not to show that a private language is impossible but to show that certain things one might want to say about language are ultimately incoherent. If we really try to picture a world of private objects (sensations) and inner acts of meaning and so on, we see that what we picture is either regular public language or incomprehensible behavior (the man might as well quack as say or write 'S').

This does not, as has been alleged, make Wittgenstein a behaviorist. He does not deny the existence of sensations or experiences. Pains, tickles, itches, etc. are all part of human life, of course. At Philosophical Investigations Sect. 293 Wittgenstein says that "if we construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation' the object drops out of consideration as irrelevant." This suggests not that pains and so on are irrelevant but that we should not construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation'. If we want to understand a concept like pain we should not think of a pain as a private object referred to somehow by the public word "pain." A pain is not "a something," just as love, democracy and strength are not things, but it is no more "a nothing" than they are either (see Philosophical Investigations Sect. 304). Saying this is hardly satisfactory, but there is no simple answer to the question "What is pain?" Wittgenstein offers not an answer but a kind of philosophical 'therapy' intended to clear away what can seem so obscure. To judge the value of this therapy, the reader will just have to read Wittgenstein's work for herself.

The best known work on Wittgenstein's writings on this whole topic is Saul A. Kripke's Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Kripke is struck by the idea that anything might count as continuing a series or following a rule in the same way. It all depends on how the rule or series is interpreted. And any rule for interpretation will itself be subject to a variety of interpretations, and so on. What counts as following a rule correctly, then, is not determined somehow by the rule itself but by what the relevant linguistic community accepts as following the rule. So whether two plus two equals four depends not on some abstract, extra-human rule of addition, but on what we, and especially the people we appoint as experts, accept. Truth conditions are replaced by assertability conditions. To put it crudely, what counts is not what is true or right (in some sense independent of the community of language users), but what you can get away with or get others to accept.

Kripke's theory is clear and ingenious, and owes a lot to Wittgenstein, but is doubtful as an interpretation of Wittgenstein. Kripke himself presents the argument not as Wittgenstein's, nor as his own, but as "Wittgenstein's argument as it struck Kripke" (Kripke p.5). That the argument is not Wittgenstein's is suggested by the fact that it is a theory, and Wittgenstein rejected philosophical theories, and by the fact that the argument relies heavily on the first sentence of Philosophical Investigations Sect. 201: "This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule." For Kripke's theory as a reading of Wittgenstein, it is not good that the very next paragraph begins, "It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here..." Still, it is no easy matter to see just where Wittgenstein does diverge from the hybrid person often referred to as 'Kripkenstein'. The key perhaps lies later in the same paragraph, where Wittgenstein writes that "there is a way of grasping a rule which is not an interpretation". Many scholars, notably Baker and Hacker, have gone to great lengths to explain why Kripke is mistaken. Since Kripke is so much easier to understand, one of the best ways into Wittgenstein's philosophy is to study Kripke and his Wittgensteinian critics. At the very least, Kripke introduces his readers well to issues that were of great concern to Wittgenstein and shows their importance.

7. Realism and Anti-Realism

Wittgenstein's place in the debate about philosophical Realism and Anti-Realism is an interesting one. His emphasis on language and human behavior, practices, etc. makes him a prime candidate for Anti-Realism in many people's eyes. He has even been accused of linguistic idealism, the idea that language is the ultimate reality. The laws of physics, say, would by this theory just be laws of language, the rules of the language game of physics. Anti-Realist scepticism of this kind has proved quite popular in the philosophy of science and in theology, as well as more generally in metaphysics and ethics.

On the other hand, there is a school of Wittgensteinian Realism, which is less well known. Wittgenstein's views on religion, for instance, are often compared with those of Simone Weil, who was a Platonist of sorts. Sabina Lovibond argues for a kind of Wittgensteinian Realism in ethics in her Realism and Imagination in Ethics and the influence of Wittgenstein is clear in Raimond Gaita's Good and Evil: An Absolute Conception. However, one should not go too far with the idea of Wittgensteinian Realism. Lovibond, for instance, equates objectivity with intersubjectivity (universal agreement), so her Realism is of a controversial kind.

Both Realism and Anti-Realism, though, are theories, or schools of theories, and Wittgenstein explicitly rejects the advocacy of theories in philosophy. This does not prove that he practiced what he preached, but it should give us pause. It is also worth noting that supporters of Wittgenstein often claim that he was neither a Realist nor an Anti-Realist, at least with regard to metaphysics. There is something straightforwardly unWittgensteinian about the Realist's belief that language/thought can be compared with reality and found to 'agree' with it. The Anti-Realist says that we could not get outside our thought or language (or form of life or language games) to compare the two. But Wittgenstein was concerned not with what we can or cannot do, but with what makes sense. If metaphysical Realism is incoherent then so is its opposite. The nonsensical utterance "laubgefraub" is not to be contradicted by saying, "No, it is not the case that laubgefraub," or "Laubgefraub is a logical impossibility." If Realism is truly incoherent, as Wittgenstein would say, then so is Anti-Realism.

8. Certainty

Wittgenstein's last writings were on the subject of certainty. He wrote in response to G.E. Moore's attack on scepticism about the external world. Moore had held up one hand, said "Here is one hand," then held up his other hand and said "and here is another." His point was that things outside the mind really do exist, we know they do, and that no grounds for scepticism could be strong enough to undermine this commonsense knowledge.

Wittgenstein did not defend scepticism, but questioned Moore's claim to know that he had two hands. Such 'knowledge' is not something that one is ever taught, or finds out, or proves. It is more like a background against which we come to know other things. Wittgenstein compares this background to the bed of a river. This river bed provides the support, the context, in which claims to know various things have meaning. The bed itself is not something we can know or doubt. In normal circumstances no sane person doubts how many hands he or she has. But unusual circumstances can occur and what was part of the river bed can shift and become part of the river. I might, for instance, wake up dazed after a terrible accident and wonder whether my hands, which I cannot feel, are still there or not. This is quite different, though, from Descartes's pretended doubt as to whether he has a body at all. Such radical doubt is really not doubt at all, from Wittgenstein's point of view. And so it cannot be dispelled by a proof that the body exists, as Moore tried to do.

9. Continuity

Wittgenstein is generally considered to have changed his thinking considerably over his philosophical career. His early work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus with its picture theory of language and mysticism, according to this view. Then there came a transitional middle period when he first returned to philosophical work after realizing that he had not solved all the problems of philosophy. This period led to his mature, later period which gave us the Philosophical Investigations and On Certainty.

There certainly are marked changes in Wittgenstein's work, but the differences between his early and late work can be exaggerated. Two central discontinuities in his work are these: whereas the Tractatus is concerned with the general form of the proposition, the general nature of metaphysics, and so on, in his later work Wittgenstein is very critical of "the craving for generality"; and, in the Tractatus Wittgenstein speaks of the central problems of philosophy, whereas the later work treats no problems as central. Another obvious difference is in Wittgenstein's style. The Tractatus is a carefully constructed set of short propositions. The Investigations, though also consisting of numbered sections, is longer, less clearly organized and more rambling, at least in appearance. This reflects Wittgenstein's rejection of the idea that there are just a few central problems in philosophy, and his insistence on paying attention to particular cases, going over the rough ground.

On the other hand, the Tractatus itself says that its propositions are nonsense and thus, in a sense (not easy to understand), rejects itself. The fact that the later work also criticizes the Tractatus is not, therefore, proof of discontinuity in Wittgenstein's work. The main change may have been one of method and style. Problems are investigated one at a time, although many overlap. There is not a full-frontal assault on the problem or problems of philosophy. Otherwise, the Tractatus and the Philosophical Investigations attack much the same problems; they just do so in different ways.

10. Wittgenstein in History

Wittgenstein's place in the history of philosophy is a peculiar one. His philosophical education was unconventional (going from engineering to working first-hand with one of the greatest philosophers of his day in Bertrand Russell) and he seems never to have felt the need to go back and make a thorough study of the history of philosophy. He was interested in Plato, admired Leibniz, but was most influenced by the work of Schopenhauer, Russell and Frege.

From Schopenhauer (perhaps) Wittgenstein got his interest in solipsism and in the ethical nature of the relation between the will and the world. Schopenhauer's saying that "The world is my idea," (from The World as Will and Idea) is echoed in such remarks as "The world is my world" (from Tractatus 5.62). What Wittgenstein means here, where he also says that what the solipsist means is quite correct, but that it cannot be said, is obscure and controversial. Some have taken him to mean that solipsism is true but for some reason cannot be expressed. H.O. Mounce, in his valuable Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction, says that this interpretation is surely wrong. Mounce's view is that Wittgenstein holds solipsism itself to be a confusion, but one that sometimes arises when one tries to express the fact that "I have a point of view on the world which is without neighbours." (Mounce p.91) Wittgenstein was not a solipsist but he remained interested in solipsism and related problems of scepticism throughout his life.

Frege was a mathematician as well as a logician. He was interested in questions of truth and falsehood, sense and reference (a distinction he made famous) and in the relation between objects and concepts, propositions and thoughts. But his interest was in logic and mathematics exclusively, not in psychology or ethics. His great contribution to logic was to introduce various mathematical elements into formal logic, including quantification, functions, arguments (in the mathematical sense of something substituted for a variable in a function) and the value of a function. In logic this value, according to Frege, is always either the True or the False, hence the notion of truth-value. Both Frege and Russell wanted to show that mathematics is an extension of logic. Undoubtedly both men influenced Wittgenstein enormously, especially since he worked first-hand with Russell. Some measure of their importance to him can be seen in the preface to the Tractatus, where Wittgenstein says that he is "indebted to Frege's great works and to the writings of my friend Mr Bertrand Russell for much of the stimulation of my thoughts." For some insight into whether Frege or Russell had the greater influence one can consider whether one would rather be recognized for his or her great works or for simply being a friend.

In turn Wittgenstein influenced twentieth century philosophy enormously. The Vienna Circle logical positivists were greatly impressed by what they found in the Tractatus, especially the idea that logic and mathematics are analytic, the verifiability principle and the idea that philosophy is an activity aimed at clarification, not the discovery of facts. Wittgenstein, though, said that it was what is not in the Tractatus that matters most.

The other group of philosophers most obviously indebted to Wittgenstein is the ordinary language or Oxford school of thought. These thinkers were more interested in Wittgenstein's later work and its attention to grammar.

Wittgenstein is thus a doubly key figure in the development and history of analytic philosophy, but he has become rather unfashionable because of his anti-theoretical, anti-scientism stance, because of the difficulty of his work, and perhaps also because he has been little understood. Similarities between Wittgenstein's work and that of Derrida are now generating interest among continental philosophers, and Wittgenstein may yet prove to be a driving force behind the emerging post-analytic school of philosophy.

11. References and Further Reading

A full bibliographical guide to works by and on Wittgenstein would fill a whole book, namely Wittgenstein: A Bibliographical Guide by Guido Frongia and Brian McGuinness (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1990). Obviously this is already out of date. Instead of a complete guide, therefore, what follows is a list of some of Wittgenstein's main works, some of the best secondary material on his work, and a few other works chosen for their accessibility and entertainment value, for want of a better expression.

a. Wittgenstein's Main Works

  • Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, translated by D.F. Pears and B.F. McGuinness (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1961).
    • His early classic.
  • The Blue and Brown Books, (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1969).
    • From his middle period, these are preliminary studies for his later work.
  • Philosophical Investigations, translated by G.E.M. Anscombe (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1963).
    • His late classic.
  • On Certainty, edited by G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright, translated by Denis Paul and G.E.M. Anscombe (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1979).
    • Like many of Wittgenstein's works, this was compiled after his death from notes he had made. In this case the notes come from the last year and a half of his life.Works of more general interest by Wittgenstein include these:
  • Culture and Value, translated by Peter Winch (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1980).
    • These are notes from throughout Wittgenstein's life dealing with all kinds of topics hinted at by its title, including music, literature, philosophy, religion and the value of silliness.
  • Lectures and Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief, edited by Cyril Barrett (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1966).
    • For 'psychology' read 'Freud', otherwise the title is explanation enough. Hilary Putnam has recommended the section on religion as a valuable introduction to Wittgenstein's philosophy as a whole.

b. Some Biographies of Wittgenstein

  • Ray Monk Ludwig Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius (Jonathan Cape, London 1990).
    • Full of enlightening detail.
  • Norman Malcolm Ludwig Wittgenstein: A Memoir (Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York 1984).
    • Shorter and includes material from G.H. von Wright as well. Two of the best books on the Tractatus are:
  • G.E.M. Anscombe An Introduction to Wittgenstein's Tractatus (University of Pennsylvania Press, Philadelphia 1971).
    • Emphasizes the importance of Frege and is notoriously difficult
  • H.O. Mounce Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1981).
    • Lighter but more reader-friendly.

c. Secondary Works

A good rule of thumb for picking secondary material on Wittgenstein is to trust Wittgenstein's own judgement. He chose G.E.M. Anscombe, Rush Rhees and G.H. von Wright to understand and deal with his unpublished writings after his death. Anything by one of these people should be fairly reliable. More contentiously, I would say that the best people writing on Wittgenstein today are James Conant and Cora Diamond. Other books referred to in the text above or of special note are these:

  • O.K. Bouwsma Wittgenstein: Conversations 1949-1951, edited by J.L. Craft and Ronald E. Hustwit (Hackett, Indianapolis 1986).
    • A seemingly little read slim volume that includes records of Wittgenstein's comments on such diverse and interesting topics as Descartes, utilitarianism and the word 'cheeseburger'.
  • Stanley Cavell The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York 1979).
    • A long, rich, challenging classic.
  • Cora Diamond The Realistic Spirit: Wittgenstein, Philosophy, and the Mind (MIT, Cambridge, Massachusetts 1991).
    • A collection of essays of varying degrees of accessibility on Frege, Wittgenstein and ethics, united by their Wittgensteinian spirit.
  • M.O'C. Drury The Danger of Words (Thoemmes Press, Bristol, U.K. and Washington, D.C. 1996).
    • A classic, including discussions of issues in psychiatry and religion by a friend of Wittgenstein's.
  • Paul Engelmann Letters from Wittgenstein with a memoir (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1967).
    • Includes discussions by Wittgenstein and his friend Engelmann on the Tractatus, religion, literature and culture.
  • Saul A. Kripke Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language (Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts 1982).
    • See the section on rules and private language above.
  • Norman Malcolm Wittgenstein: Nothing is Hidden (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1986).
    • One of the best accounts of Wittgenstein's philosophy from the disreputable point of view that the Tractatus advanced theses which are then attacked in the later work.
  • Norman Malcolm Wittgenstein: A Religious Point of View?, edited with a response by Peter Winch (Cornell University Press, Ithaca, New York 1994).
    • Malcolm basically summarizes Wittgenstein's philosophy, as he understands it, with a special emphasis on religion. Winch then responds, correcting Malcolm's account where necessary. The result is a highly accessible composite overview of Wittgenstein's work from the religious point of view, which is how Wittgenstein himself said that he saw every problem.

Author Information

Duncan J. Richter
Virginia Military Institute
U. S. A.

Vienna Circle

The Vienna Circle is a group of philosophers who gathered round Moritz Schlick, after his coming in Vienna in 1922. They organized a philosophical association, named Verein Ernst Mach (Ernst Mach Association). However, meetings on philosophy of science and epistemology began as early as 1907, promoted by Frank, Hahn and Neurath, who later arranged to bring Schlick at the University of Vienna. Among Vienna Circle's members were M. Schlick, Rudolf Carnap, H. Feigl, P. Frank, K. Gödel, H. Hahn, V. Kraft, O. Neurath, F. Waismann. Also K. R. Popper and H. Kelsen had many contacts with the Vienna Circle, although they did not belong to it. At the meetings, the Tractatus of Ludwig Wittgenstein was also discussed, and there were several meetings between Wittgenstein, Schlick, Waismann and Carnap. In 1929 Hahn, Neurath and Carnap published the manifesto of the circle: Wissenschaftliche Weltauffassung. Der Wiener Kreis (A scientific world-view. The Vienna Circle).

Vienna Circle was very active in advertising the new philosophical ideas of logical positivism. Several congresses on epistemology and philosophy of science were organized, with the help of the Berlin Circle. There were some preparatory congresses: Prague (1929), Könisberg (1930), Prague (1934) and then the first congress on scientific philosophy held in Paris (1935), followed by congresses in Copenhagen (1936), Paris (1937), Cambridge, England (1938), Cambridge, Mass. (1939). The Könisberg congress (1930) was very important, because Gödel announced he had proved the completeness of first order logic and the incompleteness of arithmetic. Another very interesting congress was the one held in Copenhagen (1936), which was dedicated to quantum physics and causality.

Between 1928 and 1937, the Vienna Circle published ten books in a series named Schriften zur wissenschaftlichen Weltauffassung (Papers on the Scientific Worldview), edited by Schlick and Frank. Among these works was Logik der Forschung, 1935, which is the first book published by K. R. Popper. Seven works were published in another series, called Einheitswissenschaft (Unified Science), edit by Carnap, Frank, Hahn, Neurath, Joergensen (after Hahn's death) and Morris (from 1938). In 1930 Carnap and Hans Reichenbach undertook the editorship of the journal Erkenntnis, which was published between 1930 and 1940 (from 1939 the editors were Neurath, Carnap and Morris).

The following is the list of works published in the two series edited by the Vienna Circle.

(1) Schriften zur wissenschaftlichen Weltauffassung (Papers on scientific world-view), edit by Schlick and Frank.

  • R. von Mises, Wahrscheinlichkeit, Statistik und Wahrheit, 1928 (Probability, statistics, and truth, New York : Macmillan company, 1939)
  • R. Carnap, Abriss der Logistik, 1929
  • M. Schlick, Fragen der Ethik, 1930 (Problems of ethics, New York : Prentice-Hall, 1939)
  • O. Neurath, Empirische Soziologie, 1931
  • P. Frank, Das Kausalgesetz und seine Grenzen, 1932 (The law of causality and its limits, Dordrecth ; Boston : Kluwer, 1997)
  • O. Kant, Zur Biologie der Ethik, 1932
  • R. Carnap, Logische Syntax der Sprache, 1934 (The logical syntax of language, New York : Humanities, 1937)
  • K. R. Popper, Logik der Forschung, 1934 (The logic of scientific discovery, New York : Basic Books, 1959)
  • J. Sch&aumlcheter, Prologomena zu einer kritischen Grammatik, 1935 (Prolegomena to a critical grammar, Dordrecth ; Boston : D. Reidel Pub. Co., 1973)
  • V. Kraft, Die Grundlagen einer wissenschaftliche Wertlehre, 1937 (Foundations for a scientific analysis of value, Dordrecth ; Boston : D. Reidel Pub. Co., 1981)

(2) Einheitswissenschaft (Unified science), edit by Carnap, Frank, Hahn, Neurath, Joergensen (after Hahn's death), Morris (from 1938)

  • H. Hahn, Logik, Mathematik und Naturerkennen, 1933
  • O. Neurath, Einheitswissenschaft und Psychologie, 1933
  • R. Carnap, Die Aufgabe der Wissenschaftlogik, 1934
  • P. Frank, Das Ende der mechanistichen Physik, 1935
  • O. Neurath, Was bedeutet rationale Wirtschaftsbetrachtung, 1935
  • O. Neurath, E. Brunswik, C. Hull, G. Mannoury, J. Woodger, Zur Enzyclop&aumldie der Einheitswissenschaft. Vortr&aumlge, 1938
  • R. von Mises, Ernst Mach und die empiritische Wissenschaftauffasung, 1939

These works are translated in Unified science - The Vienna Circle monograph series originally edited by Otto Neurath, Kluwer, 1987.

The members of the Vienna Circle were dispersed when Nazi party went into power in Germany; many of them emigrated to USA, where they taught in several universities. Schlick remained in Austria, but in 1936 he was killed by a Nazi sympathizer student in the University of Vienna.

See also Carnap, Logical positivism.

Author Information

Mauro Murzi