Category Archives: Ancient Philosophy

Socrates (469—399 B.C.E.)

SocratesSocrates is one of the few individuals whom one could say has so-shaped the cultural and intellectual development of the world that, without him, history would be profoundly different.  He is best known for his association with the Socratic method of question and answer, his claim that he was ignorant (or aware of his own absence of knowledge), and his claim that the unexamined life is not worth living, for human beings. He was the inspiration for Plato, the thinker widely held to be the founder of the Western philosophical tradition.  Plato in turn served as the teacher of Aristotle, thus establishing the famous triad of ancient philosophers: Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle.  Unlike other philosophers of his time and ours, Socrates never wrote anything down but was committed to living simply and to interrogating the everyday views and popular opinions of those in his home city of Athens.  At the age of 70, he was put to death at the hands of his fellow citizens on charges of impiety and corruption of the youth.  His trial, along with the social and political context in which occurred, has warranted as much treatment from historians and classicists as his arguments and methods have from philosophers.

This article gives an overview of Socrates: who he was, what he thought, and his purported method.  It is both historical and philosophical.  At the same time, it contains reflections on the difficult nature of knowing anything about a person who never committed any of his ideas to the written word.  Much of what is known about Socrates comes to us from Plato, although Socrates appears in the works of other ancient writers as well as those who follow Plato in the history of philosophy.  This article recognizes that finding the original Socrates may be impossible, but it attempts to achieve a close approximation.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography: Who was Socrates?
    1. The Historical Socrates
      1. Birth and Early Life
      2. Later Life and Trial
        1. The Peloponnesian War and the Threat to Democracy
        2. Greek Religion and Socrates’ Impiety
    2. The Socratic Problem: the Philosophical Socrates
      1. Origin of the Socratic Problem
      2. Aristophanes
      3. Xenophon
      4. Plato
      5. Aristotle
  2. Content: What does Socrates Think?
    1. Presocratic Philosophy and the Sophists
    2. Socratic Themes in Plato’s Apology
      1. Socratic Ignorance
      2. Priority of the Care of the Soul
      3. The Unexamined Life
    3. Other Socratic Positions and Arguments
      1. Unity of Virtue; All Virtue is Knowledge
      2. No One Errs Knowingly/No One Errs Willingly
      3. All Desire is for the Good
      4. It is Better to Suffer an Injustice Than to Commit One
      5. Eudaimonism
      6. Ruling is An Expertise
    4. Socrates the Ironist
  3. Method: How Did Socrates Do Philosophy?
    1. The Elenchus: Socrates the Refuter
      1. Topic
      2. Purpose
    2. Maieutic: Socrates the Midwife
    3. Dialectic: Socrates the Constructer
  4. Legacy: How Have Other Philosophers Understood Socrates?
    1. Hellenistic Philosophy
      1. The Cynics
      2. The Stoics
      3. The Skeptics
      4. The Epicureans
      5. The Peripatetics
    2. Modern Philosophy
      1. Hegel
      2. Kierkegaard
      3. Nietzsche
      4. Heidegger
      5. Gadamer
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Biography: Who was Socrates?

a. The Historical Socrates

i. Birth and Early Life

Socrates was born in Athens in the year 469 B.C.E. to Sophroniscus, a stonemason, and Phaenarete, a midwife.  His family was not extremely poor, but they were by no means wealthy, and Socrates could not claim that he was of noble birth like Plato.  He grew up in the political deme or district of Alopece, and when he turned 18, began to perform the typical political duties required of Athenian males.  These included compulsory military service and membership in the Assembly, the governing body responsible for determining military strategy and legislation.

In a culture that worshipped male beauty, Socrates had the misfortune of being born incredibly ugly.  Many of our ancient sources attest to his rather awkward physical appearance, and Plato more than once makes reference to it (Theaetetus 143e, Symposium, 215a-c; also Xenophon Symposium 4.19, 5.5-7 and Aristophanes Clouds 362).  Socrates was exophthalmic, meaning that his eyes bulged out of his head and were not straight but focused sideways.  He had a snub nose, which made him resemble a pig, and many sources depict him with a potbelly.  Socrates did little to help his odd appearance, frequently wearing the same cloak and sandals throughout both the day and the evening.  Plato’s Symposium (174a) offers us one of the few accounts of his caring for his appearance.

As a young man Socrates was given an education appropriate for a person of his station.  By the middle of the 5th century B.C.E., all Athenian males were taught to read and write. Sophroniscus, however, also took pains to give his son an advanced cultural education in poetry, music, and athletics.  In both Plato and Xenophon, we find a Socrates that is well versed in poetry, talented at music, and quite at-home in the gymnasium.  In accordance with Athenian custom, his father also taught him a trade, though Socrates did not labor at it on a daily basis.  Rather, he spent his days in the agora (the Athenian marketplace), asking questions of those who would speak with him.  While he was poor, he quickly acquired a following of rich young aristocrats—one of whom was Plato—who particularly enjoyed hearing him interrogate those that were purported to be the wisest and most influential men in the city.

Socrates was married to Xanthippe, and according to some sources, had a second wife.  Most suggest that he first married Xanthippe, and that she gave birth to his first son, Lamprocles.  He is alleged to have married his second wife, Myrto, without dowry, and she gave birth to his other two sons, Sophroniscus and Menexenus.  Various accounts attribute Sophroniscus to Xanthippe, while others even suggest that Socrates was married to both women simultaneously because of a shortage of males in Athens at the time.  In accordance with Athenian custom, Socrates was open about his physical attraction to young men, though he always subordinated his physical desire for them to his desire that they improve the condition of their souls.

Socrates fought valiantly during his time in the Athenian military.  Just before the Peloponnesian War with Sparta began in 431 B.C.E, he helped the Athenians win the battle of Potidaea (432 B.C.E.), after which he saved the life of Alcibiades, the famous Athenian general.  He also fought as one of 7,000 hoplites aside 20,000 troops at the battle of Delium (424 B.C.E.) and once more at the battle of Amphipolis (422 B.C.E.).  Both battles were defeats for Athens.

Despite his continued service to his city, many members of Athenian society perceived Socrates to be a threat to their democracy, and it is this suspicion that largely contributed to his conviction in court.  It is therefore imperative to understand the historical context in which his trial was set.

ii. Later Life and Trial

1. The Peloponnesian War and the Threat to Democracy

Between 431—404 B.C.E. Athens fought one of its bloodiest and most protracted conflicts with neighboring Sparta, the war that we now know as the Peloponnesian War.  Aside from the fact that Socrates fought in the conflict, it is important for an account of his life and trial because many of those with whom Socrates spent his time became either sympathetic to the Spartan cause at the very least or traitors to Athens at worst.  This is particularly the case with those from the more aristocratic Athenian families, who tended to favor the rigid and restricted hierarchy of power in Sparta instead of the more widespread democratic distribution of power and free speech to all citizens that obtained in Athens.  Plato more than once places in the mouth of his character Socrates praise for Sparta (Protagoras 342b, Crito 53a; cf. Republic 544c in which most people think the Spartan constitution is the best).  The political regime of the Republic is marked by a small group of ruling elites that preside over the citizens of the ideal city.

There are a number of important historical moments throughout the war leading up to Socrates’ trial that figure in the perception of him as a traitor.  Seven years after the battle of Amphipolis, the Athenian navy was set to invade the island of Sicily, when a number of statues in the city called “herms”, dedicated to the god Hermes, protector of travelers, were destroyed.  Dubbed the ‘Mutilation of the Herms’ (415 B.C.E.), this event engendered not only a fear of those who might seek to undermine the democracy, but those who did not respect the gods.  In conjunction with these crimes, Athens witnessed the profanation of the Eleusinian mysteries, religious rituals that were to be conducted only in the presence of priests but that were in this case performed in private homes without official sanction or recognition of any kind.  Amongst those accused and persecuted on suspicion of involvement in the crimes were a number of Socrates’ associates, including Alcibiades, who was recalled from his position leading the expedition in Sicily.  Rather than face prosecution for the crime, Alcibiades escaped and sought asylum in Sparta.

Though Alcibiades was not the only of Socrates’ associates implicated in the sacrilegious crimes (Charmides and Critias were suspected as well), he is arguably the most important.  Socrates had by many counts been in love with Alcibiades and Plato depicts him pursuing or speaking of his love for him in many dialogues (Symposium 213c-d, Protagoras 309a, Gorgias 481d, Alcibiades I 103a-104c, 131e-132a).  Alcibiades is typically portrayed as a wandering soul (Alcibiades I 117c-d), not committed to any one consistent way of life or definition of justice.  Instead, he was a kind of cameleon-like flatterer that could change and mold himself in order to please crowds and win political favor (Gorgias 482a).  In 411 B.C.E., a group of citizens opposed to the Athenian democracy led a coup against the government in hopes of establishing an oligarchy.  Though the democrats put down the coup later that year and recalled Alcibiades to lead the Athenian fleet in the Hellespont, he aided the oligarchs by securing for them an alliance with the Persian satraps.  Alcibiades therefore did not just aid the Spartan cause but allied himself with Persian interests as well.  His association with the two principal enemies of Athens reflected poorly on Socrates, and Xenophon tells us that Socrates’ repeated association with and love for Alcibiades was instrumental in the suspicion that he was a Spartan apologist.

Sparta finally defeated Athens in 404 B.C.E., just five years before Socrates’ trial and execution.  Instead of a democracy, they installed as rulers a small group of Athenians who were loyal to Spartan interests.  Known as “The Thirty” or sometimes as the “Thirty Tyrants”, they were led by Critias, a known associate of Socrates and a member of his circle.  Critias’ nephew Charmides, about whom we have a Platonic dialogue of the same name, was also a member.  Though Critias put forth a law prohibiting Socrates from conducting discussions with young men under the age of 30, Socrates’ earlier association with him—as well as his willingness to remain in Athens and endure the rule of the Thirty rather than flee—further contributed to the growing suspicion that Socrates was opposed to the democratic ideals of his city.

The Thirty ruled tyrannically—executing a number of wealthy Athenians as well as confiscating their property, arbitrarily arresting those with democratic sympathies, and exiling many others—until they were overthrown in 403 B.C.E. by a group of democratic exiles returning to the city.  Both Critias and Charmides were killed and, after a Spartan-sponsored peace accord, the democracy was restored.  The democrats proclaimed a general amnesty in the city and thereby prevented politically motivated legal prosecutions aimed at redressing the terrible losses incurred during the reign of the Thirty.  Their hope was to maintain unity during the reestablishment of their democracy.

One of Socrates’ main accusers, Anytus, was one of the democratic exiles that returned to the city to assist in the overthrow of the Thirty.  Plato’s Meno, set in the year 402 B.C.E., imagines a conversation between Socrates and Anytus in which the latter argues that any citizen of Athens can teach virtue, an especially democratic view insofar as it assumes knowledge of how to live well is not the restricted domain of the esoteric elite or privileged few.  In the discussion, Socrates argues that if one wants to know about virtue, one should consult an expert on virtue (Meno 91b-94e).  The political turmoil of the city, rebuilding itself as a democracy after nearly thirty years of destruction and bloodshed, constituted a context in which many citizens were especially fearful of threats to their democracy that came not from the outside, but from within their own city.

While many of his fellow citizens found considerable evidence against Socrates, there was also historical evidence in addition to his military service for the case that he was not just a passive but an active supporter of the democracy.  For one thing, just as he had associates that were known oligarchs, he also had associates that were supporters of the democracy, including the metic family of Cephalus and Socrates’ friend Chaerephon, the man who reported that the oracle at Delphi had proclaimed that no man was wiser than Socrates.  Additionally, when he was ordered by the Thirty to help retrieve the democratic general Leon from the island of Salamis for execution, he refused to do so.  His refusal could be understood not as the defiance of a legitimately established government but rather his allegiance to the ideals of due process that were in effect under the previously instituted democracy.  Indeed, in Plato’s Crito, Socrates refuses to escape from prison on the grounds that he lived his whole life with an implied agreement with the laws of the democracy (Crito 50a-54d).  Notwithstanding these facts, there was profound suspicion that Socrates was a threat to the democracy in the years after the end of the Peloponnesian War.  But because of the amnesty, Anytus and his fellow accusers Meletus and Lycon were prevented from bringing suit against Socrates on political grounds.  They opted instead for religious grounds.

2. Greek Religion and Socrates’ Impiety

Because of the amnesty the charges made against Socrates were framed in religious terms.  As recounted by Diogenes Laertius (1.5.40), the charges were stated as follows: “Socrates does criminal wrong by not recognizing the gods that the city recognizes, and furthermore by introducing new divinities; and he also does criminal wrong by corrupting the youth” (other accounts: Xenophon Memorabilia I.I.1 and Apology 11-12, Plato, Apology 24b and Euthyphro 2c-3b).  Many people understood the charge about corrupting the youth to signify that Socrates taught his subversive views to others, a claim that he adamantly denies in his defense speech by claiming that he has no wisdom to teach (Plato, Apology 20c) and that he cannot be held responsible for the actions of those that heard him speak (Plato, Apology 33a-c).

It is now customary to refer to the principal written accusation on the deposition submitted to the Athenian court as an accusation of impiety, or unholiness.  Rituals, ceremonies, and sacrifices that were officially sanctioned by the city and its officials marked ancient Greek religion.  The sacred was woven into the everyday experience of citizens who demonstrated their piety by correctly observing their ancestral traditions.  Interpretation of the gods at their temples was the exclusive domain of priests appointed and recognized by the city.  The boundary and separation between the religious and the secular that we find in many countries today therefore did not obtain in Athens.  A religious crime was consequently an offense not just against the gods, but also against the city itself.

Socrates and his contemporaries lived in a polytheistic society, a society in which the gods did not create the world but were themselves created.  Socrates would have been brought up with the stories of the gods recounted in Hesiod and Homer, in which the gods were not omniscient, omnibenevolent, or eternal, but rather power-hungry super-creatures that regularly intervened in the affairs of human beings.  One thinks for example of Aphrodite saving Paris from death at the hands of Menelaus (Homer, Iliad 3.369-382) or Zeus sending Apollo to rescue the corpse of Sarpedon after his death in battle (Homer, Iliad 16.667-684).  Human beings were to fear the gods, sacrifice to them, and honor them with festivals and prayers.

Socrates instead seemed to have a conception of the divine as always benevolent, truthful, authoritative, and wise.  For him, divinity always operated in accordance with the standards of rationality.  This conception of divinity, however, dispenses with the traditional conception of prayer and sacrifice as motivated by hopes for material payoff.  Socrates’ theory of the divine seemed to make the most important rituals and sacrifices in the city entirely useless, for if the gods are all good, they will benefit human beings regardless of whether or not human beings make offerings to them.  Jurors at his trial might have thought that, without the expectation of material reward or protection from the gods, Socrates was disconnecting religion from its practical roots and its connection with the civic identity of the city.

While Socrates was critical of blind acceptance of the gods and the myths we find in Hesiod and Homer, this in itself was not unheard of in Athens at the time.  Solon, Xenophanes, Heraclitus, and Euripides had all spoken against the capriciousness and excesses of the gods without incurring penalty.  It is possible to make the case that Socrates’ jurors might not have indicted him solely on questioning the gods or even of interrogating the true meaning of piety.  Indeed, there was no legal definition of piety in Athens at the time, and jurors were therefore in a similar situation to the one in which we find Socrates in Plato’s Euthyphro, that is, in need of an inquiry into what the nature of piety truly is.  What seems to have concerned the jurors was not only Socrates’ challenge to the traditional interpretation of the gods of the city, but his seeming allegiance to an entirely novel divine being, unfamiliar to anyone in the city.

This new divine being is what is known as Socrates’ daimon.  Though it has become customary to think of a daimon as a spirit or quasi-divinity (for example, Symposium 202e-203a), in ancient Greek religion it was not solely a specific class of divine being but rather a mode of activity, a force that drives a person when no particular divine agent can be named (Burkett, 180).  Socrates claimed to have heard a sign or voice from his days as a child that accompanied him and forbid him to pursue certain courses of action (Plato, Apology 31c-d, 40a-b, Euthydemus 272e-273a, Euthyphro 3b, Phaedrus 242b, Theages 128-131a, Theaetetus 150c-151b, Rep 496c; Xenophon, Apology 12, Memorabilia 1.1.3-5).  Xenophon adds that the sign also issued positive commands (Memorablia 1.1.4, 4.3.12, 4.8.1, Apology 12).  This sign was accessible only to Socrates, private and internal to his own mind.  Whether Socrates received moral knowledge of any sort from the sign is a matter of scholarly debate, but beyond doubt is the strangeness of Socrates’ insistence that he took private instructions from a deity that was unlicensed by the city.  For all the jurors knew, the deity could have been hostile to Athenian interests.  Socrates’ daimon was therefore extremely influential in his indictment on the charge of worshipping new gods unknown to the city (Plato, Euthyphro 3b, Xenophon, Memorabilia I.1.2).

Whereas in Plato’s Apology Socrates makes no attempt to reconcile his divine sign with traditional views of piety, Xenophon’s Socrates argues that just as there are those who rely on birdcalls and receive guidance from voices, so he too is influenced by his daimon.  However, Socrates had no officially sanctioned religious role in the city.  As such, his attempt to assimilate himself to a seer or necromancer appointed by the city to interpret divine signs actually may have undermined his innocence, rather than help to establish it.  His insistence that he had direct, personal access to the divine made him appear guilty to enough jurors that he was sentenced to death.

b. The Socratic Problem: the Philosophical Socrates

The Socratic problem is the problem faced by historians of philosophy when attempting to reconstruct the ideas of the original Socrates as distinct from his literary representations.  While we know many of the historical details of Socrates’ life and the circumstances surrounding his trial, Socrates’ identity as a philosopher is much more difficult to establish.  Because he wrote nothing, what we know of his ideas and methods comes to us mainly from his contemporaries and disciples.

There were a number of Socrates’ followers who wrote conversations in which he appears.  These works are what are known as the logoi sokratikoi, or Socratic accounts.  Aside from Plato and Xenophon, most of these dialogues have not survived.  What we know of them comes to us from other sources.  For example, very little survives from the dialogues of Antisthenes, whom Xenophon reports as one of Socrates’ leading disciples.  Indeed, from polemics written by the rhetor Isocrates, some scholars have concluded that he was the most prominent Socratic in Athens for the first decade following Socrates’ death.  Diogenes Laertius (6.10-13) attributes to Antisthenes a number of views that we recognize as Socratic, including that virtue is sufficient for happiness, the wise man is self-sufficient, only the virtuous are noble, the virtuous are friends, and good things are morally fine and bad things are base.

Aeschines of Sphettus wrote seven dialogues, all of which have been lost.  It is possible for us to reconstruct the plots of two of them: the Alcibiades—in which Socrates shames Alcibiades into admitting he needs Socrates’ help to be virtuous—and the Aspasia—in which Socrates recommends the famous wife of Pericles as a teacher for the son of Callias.  Aeschines’ dialogues focus on Socrates’ ability to help his interlocutor acquire self-knowledge and better himself.

Phaedo of Elis wrote two dialogues.  His central use of Socrates is to show that philosophy can improve anyone regardless of his social class or natural talents.  Euclides of Megara wrote six dialogues, about which we know only their titles.  Diogenes Laertius reports that he held that the good is one, that insight and prudence are different names for the good, and that what is opposed to the good does not exist.  All three are Socratic themes.  Lastly, Aristippus of Cyrene wrote no Socratic dialogues but is alleged to have written a work entitled To Socrates.

The two Socratics on whom most of our philosophical understanding of Socrates depends are Plato and Xenophon.  Scholars also rely on the works of the comic playwright Aristophanes and Plato’s most famous student, Aristotle.

i. Origin of the Socratic Problem

The Socratic problem first became pronounced in the early 19th century with the influential work of Friedrich Schleiermacher.  Until this point, scholars had largely turned to Xenophon to identify what the historical Socrates thought.  Schleiermacher argued that Xenophon was not a philosopher but rather a simple citizen-soldier, and that his Socrates was so dull and philosophically uninteresting that, reading Xenophon alone, it would be difficult to understand the reputation accorded Socrates by so many of his contemporaries and nearly all the schools of philosophy that followed him.  The better portrait of Socrates, Schleiermacher claimed, comes to us from Plato.

Though many scholars have since jettisoned Xenophon as a legitimate source for representing the philosophical views of the historical Socrates, they remain divided over the reliability of the other three sources.  For one thing, Aristophanes was a comic playwright, and therefore took considerable poetic license when scripting his characters.  Aristotle, born 15 years after Socrates’ death, hears about Socrates primarily from Plato. Plato himself wrote dialogues or philosophical dramas, and thus cannot be understood to be presenting his readers with exact replicas or transcriptions of conversations that Socrates actually had.  Furthermore, many scholars think that Plato’s so-called middle and late dialogues do not present the views of the historical Socrates.

We therefore see the difficult nature of the Socratic problem: because we don’t seem to have any consistently reliable sources, finding the true Socrates or the original Socrates proves to be an impossible task.  What we are left with, instead, is a composite picture assembled from various literary and philosophical components that give us what we might think of as Socratic themes or motifs.

ii. Aristophanes

Born in 450 B.C.E., Aristophanes wrote a number of comic plays intended to satirize and caricature many of his fellow Athenians.  His Clouds (423 B.C.E.) was so instrumental in parodying Socrates and painting him as a dangerous intellectual capable of corrupting the entire city that Socrates felt compelled in his trial defense to allude to the bad reputation he acquired as a result of the play (Plato, Apology 18a-b, 19c).  Aristophanes was much closer in age to Socrates than Plato and Xenophon, and as such is the only one of our sources exposed to Socrates in his younger years.

In the play, Socrates is the head of a phrontistêrion, a school of learning where students are taught the nature of the heavens and how to win court cases.  Socrates appears in a swing high above the stage, purportedly to better study the heavens.  His patron deities, the clouds, represent his interest in meteorology and may also symbolize the lofty nature of reasoning that may take either side of an argument.  The main plot of the play centers on an indebted man called Strepsiades, whose son Phidippides ends up in the school to learn how to help his father avoid paying off his debts.  By the end of the play, Phidippides has beaten his father, arguing that it is perfectly reasonable to do so on the grounds that, just as it is acceptable for a father to spank his son for his own good, so it is acceptable for a son to hit a father for his own good.  In addition to the theme that Socrates corrupts the youth, we therefore also find in the Clouds the origin of the rumor that Socrates makes the stronger argument the weaker and the weaker argument the stronger.  Indeed, the play features a personification of the Stronger Argument—which represents traditional education and values—attacked by the Weaker Argument—which advocates a life of pleasure.

While the Clouds is Aristophanes’ most famous and comprehensive attack on Socrates, Socrates appears in other of his comedies as well.  In the Birds (414 B.C.E.), Aristophanes coins a Greek verb based on Socrates’ name to insinuate that Socrates was truly a Spartan sympathizer (1280-83).  Young men who were found “Socratizing” were expressing their admiration of Sparta and its customs.  And in the Frogs (405), the Chorus claims that it is not refined to keep company with Socrates, who ignores the poets and wastes time with ‘frivolous words’ and ‘pompous word-scraping’ (1491-1499).

Aristophanes’ Socrates is a kind of variegated caricature of trends and new ideas emerging in Athens that he believed were threatening to the city.  We find a number of such themes prevalent in Presocratic philosophy and the teachings of the Sophists, including those about natural science, mathematics, social science, ethics, political philosophy, and the art of words.  Amongst other things, Aristophanes was troubled by the displacement of the divine through scientific explanations of the world and the undermining of traditional morality and custom by explanations of cultural life that appealed to nature instead of the gods.  Additionally, he was reticent about teaching skill in disputation, for fear that a clever speaker could just as easily argue for the truth as argue against it.  These issues constitute what is sometimes called the “new learning” developing in 5th century B.C.E. Athens, for which the Aristophanic Socrates is the iconic symbol.

iii. Xenophon

Born in the same decade as Plato (425 B.C.E.), Xenophon lived in the political deme of Erchia.  Though he knew Socrates he would not have had as much contact with him as Plato did.  He was not present in the courtroom on the day of Socrates’ trial, but rather heard an account of it later on from Hermogenes, a member of Socrates’ circle.  His depiction of Socrates is found principally in four works: Apology—in which Socrates gives a defense of his life before his jurors—Memorabilia—in which Xenophon himself explicates the charges against Socrates and tries to defend him—Symposium—a conversation between Socrates and his friends at a drinking party—and Oeconomicus—a Socratic discourse on estate management.  Socrates also appears in Xenophon’s Hellenica and Anabasis.

Xenophon’s reputation as a source on the life and ideas of Socrates is one on which scholars do not always agree.  Largely thought to be a significant source of information about Socrates before the 19th century, for most of the 20th century Xenophon’s ability to depict Socrates as a philosopher was largely called into question.  Following Schleiermacher, many argued that Xenophon himself was either a bad philosopher who did not understand Socrates, or not a philosopher at all, more concerned with practical, everyday matters like economics.  However, recent scholarship has sought to challenge this interpretation, arguing that it assumes an understanding of philosophy as an exclusively speculative and critical endeavor that does not attend to the ancient conception of philosophy as a comprehensive way of life.

While Plato will likely always remain the principal source on Socrates and Socratic themes, Xenophon’s Socrates is distinct in philosophically interesting ways.  He emphasizes the values of self-mastery (enkrateia), endurance of physical pain (karteria), and self-sufficiency (autarkeia).  For Xenophon’s Socrates, self-mastery or moderation is the foundation of virtue (Memorabilia, 1.5.4).  Whereas in Plato’s Apology the oracle tells Chaerephon that no one is wiser than Socrates, in Xenophon’s Apology Socrates claims that the oracle told Chaerephon that “no man was more free than I, more just, and more moderate” (Xenophon, Apology, 14).

Part of Socrates’ freedom consists in his freedom from want, precisely because he has mastered himself.  As opposed to Plato’s Socrates, Xenophon’s Socrates is not poor, not because he has much, but because he needs little.  Oeconomicus 11.3 for instance shows Socrates displeased with those who think him poor.  One can be rich even with very little on the condition that one has limited his needs, for wealth is just the excess of what one has over what one requires.  Socrates is rich because what he has is sufficient for what he needs (Memorabilia 1.2.1, 1.3.5, 4.2.38-9).

We also find Xenophon attributing to Socrates a proof of the existence of God.  The argument holds that human beings are the product of an intelligent design, and we therefore should conclude that there is a God who is the maker (dēmiourgos) or designer of all things (Memorabilia 1.4.2-7).  God creates a systematically ordered universe and governs it in the way our minds govern our bodies (Memorabilia 1.4.1-19, 4.3.1-18).  While Plato’s Timaeus tells the story of a dēmiourgos creating the world, it is Timaeus, not Socrates, who tells the story.  Indeed, Socrates speaks only sparingly at the beginning of the dialogue, and most scholars do not count as Socratic the cosmological arguments therein.

iv. Plato

Plato was Socrates’ most famous disciple, and the majority of what most people know about Socrates is known about Plato’s Socrates.  Plato was born to one of the wealthiest and politically influential families in Athens in 427 B.C.E., the son of Ariston and Perictione. His brothers were Glaucon and Adeimantus, who are Socrates’ principal interlocutors for the majority of the Republic.  Though Socrates is not present in every Platonic dialogue, he is in the majority of them, often acting as the main interlocutor who drives the conversation.

The attempt to extract Socratic views from Plato’s texts is itself a notoriously difficult problem, bound up with questions about the order in which Plato composed his dialogues, one’s methodological approach to reading them, and whether or not Socrates, or anyone else for that matter, speaks for Plato.  Readers interested in the details of this debate should consult “Plato.”  Generally speaking, the predominant view of Plato’s Socrates in the English-speaking world from the middle to the end of the 20th century was simply that he was Plato’s mouthpiece.  In other words, anything Socrates says in the dialogues is what Plato thought at the time he wrote the dialogue.  This view, put forth by the famous Plato scholar Gregory Vlastos, has been challenged in recent years, with some scholars arguing that Plato has no mouthpiece in the dialogues (see Cooper xxi-xxiii).  While we can attribute to Plato certain doctrines that are consistent throughout his corpus, there is no reason to think that Socrates, or any other speaker, always and consistently espouses these doctrines.

The main interpretive obstacle for those seeking the views of Socrates from Plato is the question of the order of the dialogues.  Thrasyllus, the 1st century (C.E.) Platonist who was the first to arrange the dialogues according to a specific paradigm, organized the dialogues into nine tetralogies, or groups of four, on the basis of the order in which he believed they should be read.  Another approach, customary for most scholars by the late 20th century, groups the dialogues into three categories on the basis of the order in which Plato composed them.  Plato begins his career, so the narrative goes, representing his teacher Socrates in typically short conversations about ethics, virtue, and the best human life.  These are “early” dialogues.  Only subsequently does Plato develop his own philosophical views—the most famous of which is the doctrine of the Forms or Ideas—that Socrates defends.  These “middle” dialogues put forth positive doctrines that are generally thought to be Platonic and not Socratic. Finally, towards the end of his life, Plato composes dialogues in which Socrates typically either hardly features at all or is altogether absent.  These are the “late” dialogues.

There are a number of complications with this interpretive thesis, and many of them focus on the portrayal of Socrates.  Though the Gorgias is an early dialogue, Socrates concludes the dialogue with a myth that some scholars attribute to a Pythagorean influence on Plato that he would not have had during Socrates’ lifetime.  Though the Parmenides is a middle dialogue, the younger Socrates speaks only at the beginning before Parmenides alone speaks for the remainder of the dialogue.  While the Philebus is a late dialogue, Socrates is the main speaker.  Some scholars identify the Meno as an early dialogue because Socrates refutes Meno’s attempts to articulate the nature of virtue.  Others, focusing on Socrates’ use of the theory of recollection and the method of hypothesis, argue that it is a middle dialogue.  Finally, while Plato’s most famous work the Republic is a middle dialogue, some scholars make a distinction within the Republic itself.  The first book, they argue, is Socratic, because in it we find Socrates refuting Thrasymachus’ definition of justice while maintaining that he knows nothing about justice.  The rest of the dialogue they claim, with its emphasis on the division of the soul and the metaphysics of the Forms, is Platonic.

To discern a consistent Socrates in Plato is therefore a difficult task.  Instead of speaking about chronology of composition, contemporary scholars searching for views that are likely to have been associated with the historical Socrates generally focus on a group of dialogues that are united by topical similarity.  These “Socratic dialogues” feature Socrates as the principal speaker, challenging his interlocutor to elaborate on and critically examine his own views while typically not putting forth substantive claims of his own.  These dialogues—including those that some scholars think are not written by Plato and those that most scholars agree are not written by Plato but that Thrasyllus included in his collection—are as follows: Euthyphro, Apology, Crito, Alcibiades I, Alcibiades II, Hipparchus, Rival Lovers, Theages, Charmides, Laches, Lysis, Euthydemus, Protagoras, Gorgias, Meno, Greater Hippias, Lesser Hippias, Ion, Menexenus, Clitophon, Minos.  Some of the more famous positions Socrates defends in these dialogues are covered in the content section.

v. Aristotle

Aristotle was born in 384 B.C.E., fifteen 15 years after the death of Socrates.  At the age of eighteen, he went to study at Plato’s Academy, and remained there for twenty years.  Afterwards, he traveled throughout Asia and was invited by Phillip II of Macedon to tutor his son Alexander, known to history as Alexander the Great.  While Aristotle would never have had the chance to meet Socrates, we have in his writings an account of both Socrates’ method and the topics about which he had conversations.  Given the likelihood that Aristotle heard about Socrates from Plato and those at his Academy, it is not surprising that most of what he says about Socrates follows the depiction of him in the Platonic dialogues.

Aristotle related four concrete points about Socrates.  The first is that Socrates asked questions without supplying an answer of his own, because he claimed to know nothing (De Elenchis Sophisticus 1836b6-8).  The picture of Socrates here is consistent with that of Plato’s Apology.  Second, Aristotle claims that Socrates never asked questions about nature, but concerned himself only with ethical questions.  Aristotle thus attributes to the historical Socrates both the method and topics we find in Plato’s Socratic dialogues.

Third, Aristotle claims that Socrates is the first to have employed epagōgē, a word typically rendered in English as “induction.”  This translation, however, is misleading, lest we impute to Socrates a preference for inductive reasoning as opposed to deductive reasoning.  The term better indicates that Socrates was fond or arguing via the use of analogy.  For instance, just as a doctor does not practice medicine for himself but for the best interest of his patient, so the ruler in the city takes no account of his own personal profit, but is rather interested in caring for his citizens (Republic 342d-e).

The fourth and final claim Aristotle makes about Socrates itself has two parts.  First, Socrates was the first to ask the question, ti esti: what is it?  For example, if someone were to suggest to Socrates that our children should grow up to be courageous, he would ask, what is courage?  That is, what is the universal definition or nature that holds for all examples of courage?  Second, as distinguished from Plato, Socrates did not separate universals from their particular instantiations.  For Plato, the noetic object, the knowable thing, is the separate universal, not the particular.  Socrates simply asked the “what is it” question (on this and the previous two points, see Metaphysics I.6.987a29-b14; cf. b22-24, b27-33, and see XIII.4.1078b12-34).

2. Content: What does Socrates Think?

Given the nature of these sources, the task of recounting what Socrates thought is not an easy one.  Nonetheless, reading Plato’s Apology, it is possible to articulate a number of what scholars today typically associate with Socrates.  Plato the author has his Socrates claim that Plato was present in the courtroom for Socrates’ defense (Apology 34a), and while this cannot mean that Plato records the defense as a word for word transcription, it is the closest thing we have to an account of what Socrates actually said at a concrete point in his life.

a. Presocratic Philosophy and the Sophists

Socrates opens his defense speech by defending himself against his older accusers (Apology 18a), claiming they have poisoned the minds of his jurors since they were all young men.  Amongst these accusers was Aristophanes.  In addition to the claim that Socrates makes the worse argument into the stronger, there is a rumor that Socrates idles the day away talking about things in the sky and below the earth.  His reply is that he never discusses such topics (Apology 18a-c).  Socrates is distinguishing himself here not just from the sophists and their alleged ability to invert the strength of arguments, but from those we have now come to call the Presocratic philosophers.

The Presocratics were not just those who came before Socrates, for there are some Presocratic philosophers who were his contemporaries.  The term is sometimes used to suggest that, while Socrates cared about ethics, the Presocratic philosophers did not.  This is misleading, for we have evidence that a number of Presocratics explored ethical issues.  The term is best used to refer to the group of thinkers whom Socrates did not influence and whose fundamental uniting characteristic was that they sought to explain the world in terms of its own inherent principles.  The 6th cn. Milesian Thales, for instance, believed that the fundamental principle of all things was water.  Anaximander believed the principle was the indefinite (apeiron), and for Anaxamines it was air.  Later in Plato’s Apology (26d-e), Socrates rhetorically asks whether Meletus thinks he is prosecuting Anaxagoras, the 5th cn. thinker who argued that the universe was originally a mixture of elements that have since been set in motion by Nous, or Mind.  Socrates suggests that he does not engage in the same sort of cosmological inquiries that were the main focus of many Presocratics.

The other group against which Socrates compares himself is the Sophists, learned men who travelled from city to city offering to teach the youth for a fee.  While he claims he thinks it an admirable thing to teach as Gorgias, Prodicus, or Hippias claim they can (Apology 20a), he argues that he himself does not have knowledge of human excellence or virtue (Apology 20b-c).  Though Socrates inquires after the nature of virtue, he does not claim to know it, and certainly does not ask to be paid for his conversations.

b. Socratic Themes in Plato’s Apology

i. Socratic Ignorance

Plato’s Socrates moves next to explain the reason he has acquired the reputation he has and why so many citizens dislike him.  The oracle at Delphi told Socrates’ friend Chaerephon, “no one is wiser than Socrates” (Apology 21a).  Socrates explains that he was not aware of any wisdom he had, and so set out to find someone who had wisdom in order to demonstrate that the oracle was mistaken.  He first went to the politicians but found them lacking wisdom.  He next visited the poets and found that, though they spoke in beautiful verses, they did so through divine inspiration, not because they had wisdom of any kind.  Finally, Socrates found that the craftsmen had knowledge of their own craft, but that they subsequently believed themselves to know much more than they actually did.  Socrates concluded that he was better off than his fellow citizens because, while they thought they knew something and did not, he was aware of his own ignorance.  The god who speaks through the oracle, he says, is truly wise, whereas human wisdom is worth little or nothing (Apology 23a).

This awareness of one’s own absence of knowledge is what is known as Socratic ignorance, and it is arguably the thing for which Socrates is most famous.  Socratic ignorance is sometimes called simple ignorance, to be distinguished from the double ignorance of the citizens with whom Socrates spoke.  Simple ignorance is being aware of one’s own ignorance, whereas double ignorance is not being aware of one’s ignorance while thinking that one knows.  In showing many influential figures in Athens that they did not know what they thought they did, Socrates came to be despised in many circles.

It is worth nothing that Socrates does not claim here that he knows nothing.  He claims that he is aware of his ignorance and that whatever it is that he does know is worthless.  Socrates has a number of strong convictions about what makes for an ethical life, though he cannot articulate precisely why these convictions are true.  He believes for instance that it is never just to harm anyone, whether friend or enemy, but he does not, at least in Book I of the Republic, offer a systematic account of the nature of justice that could demonstrate why this is true.  Because of his insistence on repeated inquiry, Socrates has refined his convictions such that he can both hold particular views about justice while maintaining that he does not know the complete nature of justice.

We can see this contrast quite clearly in Socrates’ cross-examination of his accuser Meletus.  Because he is charged with corrupting the youth, Socrates inquires after who it is that helps the youth (Apology, 24d-25a).  In the same way that we take a horse to a horse trainer to improve it, Socrates wants to know the person to whom we take a young person to educate him and improve him.  Meletus’ silence condemns him: he has never bothered to reflect on such matters, and therefore is unaware of his ignorance about matters that are the foundation of his own accusation (Apology 25b-c).  Whether or not Socrates—or Plato for that matter—actually thinks it is possible to achieve expertise in virtue is a subject on which scholars disagree.

ii. Priority of the Care of the Soul

Throughout his defense speech (Apology 20a-b, 24c-25c, 31b, 32d, 36c, 39d) Socrates repeatedly stresses that a human being must care for his soul more than anything else (see also Crito 46c-47d, Euthyphro 13b-c, Gorgias 520a4ff).  Socrates found that his fellow citizens cared more for wealth, reputation, and their bodies while neglecting their souls (Apology 29d-30b).  He believed that his mission from the god was to examine his fellow citizens and persuade them that the most important good for a human being was the health of the soul. Wealth, he insisted, does not bring about human excellence or virtue, but virtue makes wealth and everything else good for human beings (Apology 30b).

Socrates believes that his mission of caring for souls extends to the entirety of the city of Athens.  He argues that the god gave him to the city as a gift and that his mission is to help improve the city.  He thus attempts to show that he is not guilty of impiety precisely because everything he does is in response to the oracle and at the service of the god.  Socrates characterizes himself as a gadfly and the city as a sluggish horse in need of stirring up (Apology 30e).  Without philosophical inquiry, the democracy becomes stagnant and complacent, in danger of harming itself and others.  Just as the gadfly is an irritant to the horse but rouses it to action, so Socrates supposes that his purpose is to agitate those around him so that they begin to examine themselves.  One might compare this claim with Socrates’ assertion in the Gorgias that, while his contemporaries aim at gratification, he practices the true political craft because he aims at what is best (521d-e).  Such comments, in addition to the historical evidence that we have, are Socrates’ strongest defense that he is not only not a burden to the democracy but a great asset to it.

iii. The Unexamined Life

After the jury has convicted Socrates and sentenced him to death, he makes one of the most famous proclamations in the history of philosophy.  He tells the jury that he could never keep silent, because “the unexamined life is not worth living for human beings” (Apology 38a).  We find here Socrates’ insistence that we are all called to reflect upon what we believe, account for what we know and do not known, and generally speaking to seek out, live in accordance with, and defend those views that make for a well lived and meaningful life.

Some scholars call attention to Socrates’ emphasis on human nature here, and argue that the call to live examined lives follows from our nature as human beings.  We are naturally directed by pleasure and pain.  We are drawn to power, wealth and reputation, the sorts of values to which Athenians were drawn as well.  Socrates’ call to live examined lives is not necessarily an insistence to reject all such motivations and inclinations but rather an injunction to appraise their true worth for the human soul.  The purpose of the examined life is to reflect upon our everyday motivations and values and to subsequently inquire into what real worth, if any, they have.  If they have no value or indeed are even harmful, it is upon us to pursue those things that are truly valuable.

One can see in reading the Apology that Socrates examines the lives of his jurors during his own trial.  By asserting the primacy of the examined life after he has been convicted and sentenced to death, Socrates, the prosecuted, becomes the prosecutor, surreptitiously accusing those who convicted him of not living a life that respects their own humanity.  He tells them that by killing him they will not escape examining their lives.  To escape giving an account of one’s life is neither possible nor good, Socrates claims, but it is best to prepare oneself to be as good as possible (Apology 39d-e).

We find here a conception of a well-lived life that differs from one that would likely be supported by many contemporary philosophers.  Today, most philosophers would argue that we must live ethical lives (though what this means is of course a matter of debate) but that it is not necessary for everyone to engage in the sort of discussions Socrates had everyday, nor must one do so in order to be considered a good person.  A good person, we might say, lives a good life insofar as he does what is just, but he does not necessarily need to be consistently engaged in debates about the nature of justice or the purpose of the state.  No doubt Socrates would disagree, not just because the law might be unjust or the state might do too much or too little, but because, insofar as we are human beings, self-examination is always beneficial to us.

c. Other Socratic Positions and Arguments

In addition to the themes one finds in the Apology, the following are a number of other positions in the Platonic corpus that are typically considered Socratic.

i. Unity of Virtue; All Virtue is Knowledge

In the Protagoras (329b-333b) Socrates argues for the view that all of the virtues—justice, wisdom, courage, piety, and so forth—are one.  He provides a number of arguments for this thesis.  For example, while it is typical to think that one can be wise without being temperate, Socrates rejects this possibility on the grounds that wisdom and temperance both have the same opposite: folly.  Were they truly distinct, they would each have their own opposites.  As it stands, the identity of their opposites indicates that one cannot possess wisdom without temperance and vice versa.

This thesis is sometimes paired with another Socratic, view, that is, that virtue is a form of knowledge (Meno 87e-89a; cf. Euthydemus 278d-282a).  Things like beauty, strength, and health benefit human beings, but can also harm them if they are not accompanied by knowledge or wisdom.  If virtue is to be beneficial it must be knowledge, since all the qualities of the soul are in themselves neither beneficial not harmful, but are only beneficial when accompanied by wisdom and harmful when accompanied by folly.

ii. No One Errs Knowingly/No One Errs Willingly

Socrates famously declares that no one errs or makes mistakes knowingly (Protagoras 352c, 358b-b).  Here we find an example of Socrates’ intellectualism.  When a person does what is wrong, their failure to do what is right is an intellectual error, or due to their own ignorance about what is right.  If the person knew what was right, he would have done it.  Hence, it is not possible for someone simultaneously know what is right and do what is wrong.  If someone does what is wrong, they do so because they do not know what is right, and if they claim the have known what was right at the time when they committed the wrong, they are mistaken, for had they truly known what was right, they would have done it.

Socrates therefore denies the possibility of akrasia, or weakness of the will.  No one errs willingly (Protagoras 345c4-e6).  While it might seem that Socrates is equivocating between knowingly and willingly, a look at Gorgias 466a-468e helps clarify his thesis.  Tyrants and orators, Socrates tells Polus, have the least power of any member of the city because they do not do what they want.  What they do is not good or beneficial even though human beings only want what is good or beneficial.  The tyrant’s will, corrupted by ignorance, is in such a state that what follows from it will necessarily harm him.  Conversely, the will that is purified by knowledge is in such a state that what follows from it will necessarily be beneficial.

iii. All Desire is for the Good

One of the premises of the argument just mentioned is that human beings only desire the good.  When a person does something for the sake of something else, it is always the thing for the sake of which he is acting that he wants.  All bad things or intermediate things are done not for themselves but for the sake of something else that is good.  When a tyrant puts someone to death, for instance, he does this because he thinks it is beneficial in some way.  Hence his action is directed towards the good because this is what he truly wants (Gorgias 467c-468b).

A similar version of this argument is in the Meno, 77b-78b.  Those that desire bad things do not know that they are truly bad; otherwise, they would not desire them.  They do not naturally desire what is bad but rather desire those things that they believe to be good but that are in fact bad.  They desire good things even though they lack knowledge of what is actually good.

iv. It is Better to Suffer an Injustice Than to Commit One

Socrates infuriates Polus with the argument that it is better to suffer an injustice than commit one (Gorgias 475a-d).  Polus agrees that it is more shameful to commit an injustice, but maintains it is not worse.  The worst thing, in his view, is to suffer injustice.  Socrates argues that, if something is more shameful, it surpasses in either badness or pain or both.  Since committing an injustice is not more painful than suffering one, committing an injustice cannot surpass in pain or both pain and badness.  Committing an injustice surpasses suffering an injustice in badness; differently stated, committing an injustice is worse than suffering one.  Therefore, given the choice between the two, we should choose to suffer rather than commit an injustice.

This argument must be understood in terms of the Socratic emphasis on the care of the soul.  Committing an injustice corrupts one’s soul, and therefore committing injustice is the worst thing a person can do to himself (cf. Crito 47d-48a, Republic I 353d-354a).  If one commits injustice, Socrates goes so far as to claim that it is better to seek punishment than avoid it on the grounds that the punishment will purge or purify the soul of its corruption (Gorgias 476d-478e).

v. Eudaimonism

The Greek word for happiness is eudaimonia, which signifies not merely feeling a certain way but being a certain way.  A different way of translating eudaimonia is well-being.  Many scholars believe that Socrates holds two related but not equivalent principles regarding eudaimonia: first, that it is rationally required that a person make his own happiness the foundational consideration for his actions, and second, that each person does in fact pursue happiness as the foundational consideration for his actions.  In relation to Socrates’ emphasis on virtue, it is not entirely clear what that means.  Virtue could be identical to happiness—in which case there is no difference between the two and if I am virtuous I am by definition happy—virtue could be a part of happiness—in which case if I am virtuous I will be happy although I could be made happier by the addition of other goods—or virtue could be instrumental for happiness—in which case if I am virtuous I might be happy (and I couldn’t be happy without virtue), but there is no guarantee that I will be happy.

There are a number of passages in the Apology that seem to indicate that the greatest good for a human being is having philosophical conversation (36b-d, 37e-38a, 40e-41c). Meno 87c-89a suggests that knowledge of the good guides the soul toward happiness (cf. Euthydemus 278e-282a).  And at Gorgias 507a-c Socrates suggests that the virtuous person, acting in accordance with wisdom, attains happiness (cf. Gorgias 478c-e: the happiest person has no badness in his soul).

vi. Ruling is An Expertise

Socrates is committed to the theme that ruling is a kind of craft or art (technē).  As such, it requires knowledge.  Just as a doctor brings about a desired result for his patient—health, for instance—so the ruler should bring about some desired result in his subject (Republic 341c-d, 342c).  Medicine, insofar as it has the best interest of its patient in mind, never seeks to benefit the practitioner.  Similarly, the ruler’s job is to act not for his own benefit but for the benefit of the citizens of the political community.  This is not to say that there might not be some contingent benefit that accrues to the practitioner; the doctor, for instance, might earn a fine salary.  But this benefit is not intrinsic to the expertise of medicine as such.  One could easily conceive of a doctor that makes very little money.  One cannot, however, conceive of a doctor that does not act on behalf of his patient.  Analogously, ruling is always for the sake of the ruled citizen, and justice, contra the famous claim from Thrasymachus, is not whatever is in the interest of the ruling power (Republic 338c-339a).

d. Socrates the Ironist

The suspicion that Socrates is an ironist can mean a number of things: on the one hand, it can indicate that Socrates is saying something with the intent to convey the opposite meaning.  Some readers for instance, including a number in the ancient world, understood Socrates’ avowal of ignorance in precisely this way.  Many have interpreted Socrates’ praise of Euthyphro, in which he claims that he can learn from him and will become his pupil, as an example of this sort of irony (Euthyphro 5a-b).  On the other hand, the Greek word eirōneia was understood to carry with it a sense of subterfuge, rendering the sense of the word something like masking with the intent to deceive.

Additionally, there are a number of related questions about Socrates’ irony.   Is the interlocutor supposed to be aware of the irony, or is he ignorant of it?  Is it the job of the reader to discern the irony?  Is the purpose of irony rhetorical, intended to maintain Socrates’ position as the director of the conversation, or pedagogical, meant to encourage the interlocutor to learn something?  Could it be both?

Scholars disagree on the sense in which we ought to call Socrates ironic.  When Socrates asks Callicles to tell him what he means by the stronger and to go easy on him so that he might learn better, Callicles claims he is being ironic (Gorgias 489e).  Thrasymachus accuses Socrates of being ironic insofar as he pretends he does not have an account of justice, when he is actually hiding what he truly thinks (Republic 337a).  And though the Symposium is generally not thought to be a “Socratic” dialogue, we there find Alcibiades accusing Socrates of being ironic insofar as he acts like he is interested in him but then deny his advances (Symposium 216e, 218d).  It is not clear which kind of irony is at work with these examples.

Aristotle defines irony as an attempt at self-deprecation (Nicomachean Ethics 4.7, 1127b23-26).  He argues that self-deprecation is the opposite of boastfulness, and people that engage in this sort of irony do so to avoid pompousness and make their characters more attractive.  Above all, such people disclaim things that bring reputation.  On this reading, Socrates was prone to understatement.

There are some thinkers for whom Socratic irony is not just restricted to what Socrates says.  The 19th century Danish philosopher Søren Kierkegaard held the view that Socrates himself, his character, is ironic.  The 20th century philosopher Leo Strauss defined irony as the noble dissimulation of one’s worth.  On this reading, Socrates’ irony consisted in his refusal to display his superiority in front of his inferiors so that his message would be understood only by the privileged few.  As such, Socratic irony is intended to conceal Socrates’ true message.

3. Method: How Did Socrates Do Philosophy?

As famous as the Socratic themes are, the Socratic method is equally famous.  Socrates conducted his philosophical activity by means of question an answer, and we typically associate with him a method called the elenchus.  At the same time, Plato’s Socrates calls himself a midwife—who has no ideas of his own but helps give birth to the ideas of others—and proceeds dialectically—defined either as asking questions, embracing the practice of collection and division, or proceeding from hypotheses to first principles.

a. The Elenchus: Socrates the Refuter

A typical Socratic elenchus is a cross-examination of a particular position, proposition, or definition, in which Socrates tests what his interlocutor says and refutes it.  There is, however, great debate amongst scholars regarding not only what is being refuted but also whether or not the elenchus can prove anything.  There are questions, in other words, about the topic of the elenchus and its purpose or goal.

i. Topic

Socrates typically begins his elenchus with the question, “what is it”?  What is piety, he asks Euthyphro.  Euthyphro appears to give five separate definitions of piety: piety is proceeding against whomever does injustice (5d-6e), piety is what is loved by the gods (6e-7a), piety is what is loved by all the gods (9e), the godly and the pious is the part of the just that is concerned with the care of the gods (12e), and piety is the knowledge of sacrificing and praying (13d-14a).  For some commentators, what Socrates is searching for here is a definition.  Other commentators argue that Socrates is searching for more than just the definition of piety but seeks a comprehensive account of the nature of piety.  Whatever the case, Socrates refutes the answer given to him in response to the ‘what is it’ question.

Another reading of the Socratic elenchus is that Socrates is not just concerned with the reply of the interlocutor but is concerned with the interlocutor himself.  According to this view, Socrates is as much concerned with the truth or falsity of propositions as he is with the refinement of the interlocutor’s way of life.  Socrates is concerned with both epistemological and moral advances for the interlocutor and himself.  It is not propositions or replies alone that are refuted, for Socrates does not conceive of them dwelling in isolation from those that hold them.  Thus conceived, the elenchus refutes the person holding a particular view, not just the view.  For instance, Socrates shames Thrasymachus when he shows him that he cannot maintain his view that justice is ignorance and injustice is wisdom (Republic I 350d).  The elenchus demonstrates that Thrasymachus cannot consistently maintain all his claims about the nature of justice.  This view is consistent with a view we find in Plato’s late dialogue called the Sophist, in which the Visitor from Elea, not Socrates, claims that the soul will not get any advantage from learning that it is offered to it until someone shames it by refuting it (230b-d).

ii. Purpose

In terms of goal, there are two common interpretations of the elenchus.  Both have been developed by scholars in response to what Gregory Vlastos called the problem of the Socratic elenchus.  The problem is how Socrates can claim that position W is false, when the only thing he has established is its inconsistency with other premises whose truth he has not tried to establish in the elenchus.

The first response is what is called the constructivist position.  A constructivist argues that the elenchus establishes the truth or falsity of individual answers.  The elenchus on this interpretation can and does have positive results.  Vlastos himself argued that Socrates not only established the inconsistency of the interlocutor’s beliefs by showing their inconsistency, but that Socrates’ own moral beliefs were always consistent, able to withstand the test of the elenchus.  Socrates could therefore pick out a faulty premise in his elenctic exchange with an interlocutor, and sought to replace the interlocutor’s false beliefs with his own.

The second response is called the non-constructivist position.  This position claims that Socrates does not think the elenchus can establish the truth or falsity of individual answers.  The non-constructivist argues that all the elenchus can show is the inconsistency of W with the premises X, Y, and Z.  It cannot establish that ~W is the case, or for that matter replace any of the premises with another, for this would require a separate argument.  The elenchus establishes the falsity of the conjunction of W, X, Y, and Z, but not the truth or falsity of any of those premises individually.  The purpose of the elenchus on this interpretation is to show the interlocutor that he is confused, and, according to some scholars, to use that confusion as a stepping stone on the way to establishing a more consistent, well-formed set of beliefs.

b. Maieutic: Socrates the Midwife

In Plato’s Theaetetus Socrates identifies himself as a midwife (150b-151b).  While the dialogue is not generally considered Socratic, it is elenctic insofar as it tests and refutes Theaetetus’ definitions of knowledge.  It also ends without a conclusive answer to its question, a characteristic it shares with a number of Socratic dialogues.

Socrates tells Theaetetus that his mother Phaenarete was a midwife (149a) and that he himself is an intellectual midwife.  Whereas the craft of midwifery (150b-151d) brings on labor pains or relieves them in order to help a woman deliver a child, Socrates does not watch over the body but over the soul, and helps his interlocutor give birth to an idea.  He then applies the elenchus to test whether or not the intellectual offspring is a phantom or a fertile truth.  Socrates stresses that both he and actual midwives are barren, and cannot give birth to their own offspring.  In spite of his own emptiness of ideas, Socrates claims to be skilled at bringing forth the ideas of others and examining them.

c. Dialectic: Socrates the Constructer

The method of dialectic is thought to be more Platonic than Socratic, though one can understand why many have associated it with Socrates himself.  For one thing, the Greek dialegesthai ordinarily means simply “to converse” or “to discuss.”  Hence when Socrates is distinguishing this sort of discussion from rhetorical exposition in the Gorgias, the contrast seems to indicate his preference for short questions and answers as opposed to longer speeches (447b-c, 448d-449c).

There are two other definitions of dialectic in the Platonic corpus.  First, in the Republic, Socrates distinguishes between dianoetic thinking, which makes use of the senses and assumes hypotheses, and dialectical thinking, which does not use the senses and goes beyond hypotheses to first principles (Republic VII 510c-511c, 531d-535a).  Second, in the Phaedrus, Sophist, Statesman, and Philebus, dialectic is defined as a method of collection and division.  One collects things that are scattered into one kind and also divides each kind according to its species (Phaedrus 265d-266c).

Some scholars view the elenchus and dialectic as fundamentally different methods with different goals, while others view them as consistent and reconcilable.  Some even view them as two parts of one argument procedure, in which the elenchus refutes and dialectic constructs.

4. Legacy: How Have Other Philosophers Understood Socrates?

Nearly every school of philosophy in antiquity had something positive to say about Socrates, and most of them drew their inspiration from him.  Socrates also appears in the works of many famous modern philosophers.  Immanuel Kant, the 18th century German philosopher best known for the categorical imperative, hailed Socrates, amongst other ancient philosophers, as someone who didn’t just speculate but who lived philosophically.  One of the more famous quotes about Socrates is from John Stuart Mill, the 19th century utilitarian philosopher who claimed that it is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied.  The following is but a brief survey of Socrates as he is treated in philosophical thinking that emerges after the death of Aristotle in 322 B.C.E.

a. Hellenistic Philosophy

i. The Cynics

The Cynics greatly admired Socrates, and traced their philosophical lineage back to him.  One of the first representatives of the Socratic legacy was the Cynic Diogenes of Sinope.  No genuine writings of Diogenes have survived and most of our evidence about him is anecdotal.  Nevertheless, scholars attribute a number of doctrines to him.  He sought to undermine convention as a foundation for ethical values and replace it with nature.  He understood the essence of human being to be rational, and defined happiness as freedom and self-mastery, an objective readily accessible to those who trained the body and mind.

ii. The Stoics

There is a biographical story according to which Zeno, the founder of the Stoic school and not the Zeno of Zeno's Paradoxes, became interested in philosophy by reading and inquiring about Socrates.  The Stoics took themselves to be authentically Socratic, especially in defending the unqualified restriction of ethical goodness to ethical excellence, the conception of ethical excellence as a kind of knowledge, a life not requiring any bodily or external advantage nor ruined by any bodily disadvantage, and the necessity and sufficiency of ethical excellence for complete happiness.

Zeno is known for his characterization of the human good as a smooth flow of life.  Stoics were therefore attracted to the Socratic elenchus because it could expose inconsistencies—both social and psychological—that disrupted one’s life.  In the absence of justification for a specific action or belief, one would not be in harmony with oneself, and therefore would not live well.  On the other hand, if one held a position that survived cross-examination, such a position would be consistent and coherent.  The Socratic elenchus was thus not just an important social and psychological test, but also an epistemological one.  The Stoics held that knowledge was a coherent set of psychological attitudes, and therefore a person holding attitudes that could withstand the elenchus could be said to have knowledge.  Those with inconsistent or incoherent psychological commitments were thought to be ignorant.

Socrates also figures in Roman Stoicism, particularly in the works of Seneca and Epictetus.  Both men admired Socrates’ strength of character.  Seneca praises Socrates for his ability to remain consistent unto himself in the face of the threat posed by the Thirty Tyrants, and also highlights the Socratic focus on caring for oneself instead of fleeing oneself and seeking fulfillment by external means.  Epictetus, when offering advice about holding to one’s own moral laws as inviolable maxims, claims, “though you are not yet a Socrates, you ought, however, to live as one desirous of becoming a Socrates” (Enchiridion 50).

One aspect of Socrates to which Epictetus was particularly attracted was the elenchus.  Though his understanding of the process is in some ways different from Socrates’, throughout his Discourses Epictetus repeatedly stresses the importance of recognition of one’s ignorance (2.17.1) and awareness of one’s own impotence regarding essentials (2.11.1).  He characterizes Socrates as divinely appointed to hold the elenctic position (3.21.19) and associates this role with Socrates’ protreptic expertise (2.26.4-7).  Epictetus encouraged his followers to practice the elenchus on themselves, and claims that Socrates did precisely this on account of his concern with self-examination (2.1.32-3).

iii. The Skeptics

Broadly speaking, skepticism is the view that we ought to be either suspicious of claims to epistemological truth or at least withhold judgment from affirming absolute claims to knowledge.  Amongst Pyrrhonian skeptics, Socrates appears at times like a dogmatist and at other times like a skeptic or inquirer.  On the one hand, Sextus Empiricus lists Socrates as a thinker who accepts the existence of god (Against the Physicists, I.9.64) and then recounts the cosmological argument that Xenophon attributes to Socrates (Against the Physicists, I.9.92-4).  On the other hand, in arguing that human being is impossible to conceive, Sextus Empiricus cites Socrates as unsure whether or not he is a human being or something else (Outlines of Pyrrhonism 2.22).  Socrates is also said to have remained in doubt about this question (Against the Professors 7.264).

Academic skeptics grounded their position that nothing can be known in Socrates’ admission of ignorance in the Apology (Cicero, On the Orator 3.67, Academics 1.44).  Arcesilaus, the first head of the Academy to take it toward a skeptical turn, picked up from Socrates the procedure of arguing, first asking others to give their positions and then refuting them (Cicero, On Ends 2.2, On the Orator 3.67, On the Nature of the Gods 1.11).  While the Academy would eventually move away from skepticism, Cicero, speaking on behalf of the Academy of Philo, makes the claim that Socrates should be understood as endorsing the claim that nothing, other than one’s own ignorance, could be known (Academics 2.74).

iv. The Epicurean

The Epicureans were one of the few schools that criticized Socrates, though many scholars think that this was in part because of their animus toward their Stoic counterparts, who admired him.  In general, Socrates is depicted in Epicurean writings as a sophist, rhetorician, and skeptic who ignored natural science for the sake of ethical inquiries that concluded without answers.  Colotes criticizes Socrates’ statement in the Phaedrus (230a) that he does not know himself (Plutarch, Against Colotes 21 1119b), and Philodemus attacks Socrates’ argument in the Protagoras (319d) that virtue cannot be taught (Rhetoric I 261, 8ff).

The Epicureans wrote a number of books against several of Plato’s Socratic dialogues, including the Lysis, Euthydemus, and Gorgias.  In the Gorgias we find Socrates suspicious of the view that pleasure is intrinsically worthy and his insistence that pleasure is not the equivalent of the good (Gorgias 495b-499b).  In defining pleasure as freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) and defining this sort of pleasure as the sole good for human beings, the Epicureans shared little with the unbridled hedonism Socrates criticizes Callicles for embracing.  Indeed, in the Letter to Menoeceus, Epicurus explicitly argues against pursuing this sort of pleasure (131-132).  Nonetheless, the Epicureans did equate pleasure with the good, and the view that pleasure is not the equivalent of the good could not have endeared Socrates to their sentiment.

Another reason for the Epicurean refusal to praise Socrates or make him a cornerstone of their tradition was his perceived irony.  According to Cicero, Epicurus was opposed to Socrates’ representing himself as ignorant while simultaneously praising others like Protagoras, Hippias, Prodicus, and Gorgias (Rhetoric, Vol. II, Brutus 292).  This irony for the Epicureans was pedagogically pointless: if Socrates had something to say, he should have said it instead of hiding it.

v. The Peripatetics

Aristotle’s followers, the Peripatetics, either said little about Socrates or were pointedly vicious in their attacks.  Amongst other things, the Peripatetics accused Socrates of being a bigamist, a charge that appears to have gained so much traction that the Stoic Panaetius wrote a refutation of it (Plutarch, Aristides 335c-d).  The general peripatetic criticism of Socrates, similar in one way to the Epicureans, was that he concentrated solely on ethics, and that this was an unacceptable ideal for the philosophical life.

b. Modern Philosophy

i. Hegel

In Socrates, Hegel found what he called the great historic turning point (Philosophy of History, 448).  With Socrates, Hegel claims, two opposed rights came into collision: the individual consciousness and the universal law of the state.  Prior to Socrates, morality for the ancients was present but it was not present Socratically.  That is, the good was present as a universal, without its having had the form of the conviction of the individual in his consciousness (407).  Morality was present as an immediate absolute, directing the lives of citizens without their having reflected upon it and deliberated about it for themselves.  The law of the state, Hegel claims, had authority as the law of the gods, and thus had a universal validity that was recognized by all (408).

In Hegel’s view the coming of Socrates signals a shift in the relationship between the individual and morality.  The immediate now had to justify itself to the individual consciousness.  Hegel thus not only ascribes to Socrates the habit of asking questions about what one should do but also about the actions that the state has prescribed.  With Socrates, consciousness is turned back within itself and demands that the law should establish itself before consciousness, internal to it, not merely outside it (408-410).   Hegel attributes to Socrates a reflective questioning that is skeptical, which moves the individual away from unreflective obedience and into reflective inquiry about the ethical standards of one’s community.

Generally, Hegel finds in Socrates a skepticism that renders ordinary or immediate knowledge confused and insecure, in need of reflective certainty which only consciousness can bring (370).  Though he attributes to the sophists the same general skeptical comportment, in Socrates Hegel locates human subjectivity at a higher level.  With Socrates and onward we have the world raising itself to the level of conscious thought and becoming object for thought.  The question as to what Nature is gives way to the question about what Truth is, and the question about the relationship of self-conscious thought to real essence becomes the predominant philosophical issue (450-1).

ii. Kierkegaard

Kierkegaard’s most well recognized views on Socrates are from his dissertation, The Concept of Irony With Continual Reference to Socrates.  There, he argues that Socrates is not the ethical figure that the history of philosophy has thought him to be, but rather an ironist in all that he does.  Socrates does not just speak ironically but is ironic.  Indeed, while most people have found Aristophanes’ portrayal of Socrates an obvious exaggeration and caricature, Kierkegaard goes so far as to claim that he came very close to the truth in his depiction of Socrates.  He rejects Hegel’s picture of Socrates ushering in a new era of philosophical reflection and instead argues that the limits of Socratic irony testified to the need for religious faith.  As opposed to the Hegelian view that Socratic irony was an instrument in the service of the development of self-consciousness, Kierkegaard claims that irony was Socrates’ position or comportment, and that he did not have any more than this to give.

Later in his writing career Kierkegaard comes to think that he has neglected Socrates’ significance as an ethical and religious figure.  In his final essay entitled My Task, Kierkegaard claims that his mission is a Socratic one; that is, in his task to reinvigorate a Christianity that remained the cultural norm but had, in Kierkegaard’s eyes, nearly ceased altogether to be practiced authentically, Kierkegaard conceives of himself as a kind of Christian Socrates, rousing Christians from their complacency to a conception of Christian faith as the highest, most passionate expression of individual subjectivity.  Kierkegaard therefore sees himself as a sort of Christian gadfly.  The Socratic call to become aware of one’s own ignorance finds its parallel in the Kierkegaardian call to recognize one’s own failing to truly live as a Christian.  The Socratic claim to ignorance—while Socrates is closer to knowledge than his contemporaries—is replaced by the Kierkegaard’s claim that he is not a Christian—though certainly more so than his own contemporaries.

iii. Nietzsche

Nietzsche’s most famous account of Socrates is his scathing portrayal in The Birth of Tragedy, in which Socrates and rational thinking lead to the emergence of an age of decadence in Athens.  The delicate balance in Greek culture between the Apollonian—order, calmness, self-control, restraint—and the Dionysian—chaos, revelry, self-forgetfulness, indulgence— initially represented on stage in the tragedies of Aeschylus and Sophocles, gave way to the rationalism of Euripides.  Euripides, Nietzsche argues, was only a mask for the newborn demon called Socrates (section 12).  Tragedy—and Greek culture more generally—was corrupted by “aesthetic Socratism”, whose supreme law, Nietzsche argues, was that ‘to be beautiful everything must be intelligible’.  Whereas the former sort of tragedy absorbed the spectator in the activities and sufferings of its chief characters, the emergence of Socrates heralded the onset of a new kind of tragedy in which this identification is obstructed by the spectators having to figure out the meaning and presuppositions of the characters’ suffering.

Nietzsche continues his attack on Socrates later in his career in Twilight of the Idols.  Socrates here represents the lowest class of people (section 3), and his irony consists in his being an exaggeration at the same time as he conceals himself (4).  He is the inventor of dialectic (5) which he wields mercilessly because, being an ugly plebeian, he had no other means of expressing himself (6) and therefore employed question and answer to render his opponent powerless (7).  Socrates turned dialectic into a new kind of contest (8), and because his instincts had turned against each other and were in anarchy (9), he established the rule of reason as a counter-tyrant in order not to perish (10).  Socrates’ decadence here consists in his having to fight his instincts (11).  He was thus profoundly anti-life, so much so that he wanted to die (12).

Nonetheless, while Nietzsche accuses Socrates of decadence, he nevertheless recognizes him as a powerful individual, which perhaps accounts for why we at times find in Nietzsche a hesitant admiration of Socrates.  He calls Socrates one of the very greatest instinctive forces (The Birth of Tragedy, section 13), labels him as a “free spirit” (Human, All Too Human I, 433) praises him as the first “philosopher of life” in his 17th lecture on the Preplatonics, and anoints him a ‘virtuoso of life’ in his notebooks from 1875.  Additionally, contra Twilight of the Idols, in Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Nietzsche speaks of a death in which one’s virtue still shines, and some commentators have seen in this a celebration of the way in which Socrates died.

iv. Heidegger

Heidegger finds in Socrates a kinship with his own view that the truth of philosophy lies in a certain way of seeing things, and thus is identical with a particular kind of method.  He attributes to Socrates the view that the truth of some subject matter shows itself not in some definition that is the object or end of a process of inquiry, but in the very process of inquiry itself.  Heidegger characterizes the Socratic method as a kind of productive negation: by refuting that which stands in front of it—in Socrates’ case, an interlocutor’s definition—it discloses the positive in the very process of questioning.  Socrates is not interested in articulating propositions about piety but rather concerned with persisting in a questioning relation to it that preserves its irreducible sameness.  Behind multiple examples of pious action is Piety, and yet Piety is not something that can be spoken of.  It is that which discloses itself through the process of silent interrogation.

It is precisely in his emphasis on silence that Heidegger diverges from Socrates.  Where Socrates insisted on the give and take of question and answer, Heideggerian questioning is not necessarily an inquiry into the views of others but rather an openness to the truth that one maintains without the need to speak.  To remain in dialogue with a given phenomenon is not the same thing as conversing about it, and true dialogue is always silent.

v. Gadamer

As Heidegger’s student, Gadamer shares his fundamental view that truth and method cannot be divorced in philosophy.  At the same time, his hermeneutics leads him to argue for the importance of dialectic as conversation.  Gadamer claims that whereas philosophical dialectic presents the whole truth by superceding all its partial propositions, hermeneutics too has the task of revealing a totality of meaning in all its relations.  The distinguishing characteristic of Gadamer’s hermeneutical dialectic is that it recognizes radical finitude: we are always already in an open-ended dialogical situation.  Conversation with the interlocutor is thus not a distraction that leads us away from seeing the truth but rather is the site of truth.  It is for this reason that Gadamer claims Plato communicated his philosophy only in dialogues: it was more than just an homage to Socrates, but was a reflection of his view that the word find its confirmation in another and in the agreement of another.

Gadamer also sees in the Socratic method an ethical way of being.  That is, he does not just think that Socrates converses about ethics but that repeated Socratic conversation is itself indicative of an ethical comportment.  On this account, Socrates knows the good not because he can give some final definition of it but rather because of his readiness to give an account of it.  The problem of not living an examined life is not that we might live without knowing what is ethical, but because without asking questions as Socrates does, we will not be ethical.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ahbel-Rappe, Sara, and Rachana Kamtekar (eds.), A Companion to Socrates (Oxford: Blackwell, 2006).
  • Arrowsmith, William, Lattimore, Richmond, and Parker, Douglass (trans.), Four Plays by Aristophanes: The Clouds, The Birds, Lysistrata, The Frogs (New York: Meridian, 1994).
  • Barnes, Jonathan, Complete Works of Aristotle vols. 1 & 2  (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Benson, Hugh H. (ed.), Essays on the Philosophy of Socrates (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • Brickhouse, Thomas C. & Smith, Nicholas D., Plato’s Socrates (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994).
  • Burkert, Walter, Greek Religion (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1985).
  • Cooper, John M., Plato: Collected Works (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1997).
  • Guthrie, W.K.C., Socrates (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1971).
  • Kahn, Charles H., Plato and the Socratic Dialogue (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Kraut, Richard (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Plato (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992).
  • Morrison, Donald R., The Cambridge Companion to Socrates (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012).
  • Rudebusch, George, Socrates (Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009).
  • Santas, Gerasimos, Socrates: Philosophy in Plato’s Early Dialogues (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979).
  • Taylor, C.C.W, 1998, Socrates (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socrates, Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).
  • Xenophon: Memorabilia. Oeconomicus. Symposium. Apologia. (Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1923).


Author Information

James M. Ambury
King’s College
U. S. A.

Xenophon (430—354 B.C.E.)

XenophonXenophon was a Greek philosopher, soldier, historian, memoirist, and the author of numerous practical treatises on subjects ranging from horsemanship to taxation.  While best known in the contemporary philosophical world as the author of a series of sketches of Socrates in conversation, known by their Latin title Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology which present a set of vivid and intriguing portraits of Socrates and display some sharp contrasts to the better known portraits in the works of Xenophon’s contemporary, Plato.  Xenophon’s influence in Antiquity, the Middle Ages, and in Early Modern intellectual circles was considerable; he was a pioneer in several literary genres including the first-person military memoir (Anabasis) , the biographical novel (Education of Cyrus), and the continued history (Hellenica).  The range of his areas of expertise and the glancing charm of his down-to-earth writing style continue to fascinate and repay our study. For one example of his work in moral philosophy, he emphasized the importance of self-control, which comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality. This is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways.  Socrates is often said by Xenophon to have exemplified it in the very highest degree.  Cyrus displays it when he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; but his general Araspas stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor, and ignites a chain of events described by Xenophon that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Times
  2. Xenophon’s Socrates
  3. Political Philosophy
  4. Moral Philosophy
  5. Practical Treatises
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Times

Xenophon was born during the early years of the Peloponnesian War, in the outlying deme of Athens called Erchia.  Located in the fertile plain known as “Mesogeia” (literally “middle earth”) and overlooked by the beautiful mountains Hymettus and Penteli, Erchia was about 20 kilometers (12 miles) from the bustling center of Athens–about a three hour walk or one hour brisk horseback ride.  His father Gryllus owned and supervised an estate whose income derived chiefly from farming.  Thus, Xenophon will have grown up surrounded by a combination of small hold-farming and urban influences.   Coming of an age in turbulent political times, Xenophon is thought to have been in Athens and personally present at the return of Alcibiades (408), the trial of the Generals, and the overthrow of the 30 Tyrants, all signal events in the rough history of Athenian civic life.

Little else is known about Xenophon’s earliest years.  From his later writings it can be safely inferred that he received a good basic education and military training as befitted a young member of the Equestrian class, that he was able to ride and hunt extensively, and that in his formative years he observed the careful work needed to keep a modest farm maintained and productive.

In 401. B.C.E at the age of 29, Xenophon was invited by his friend Proxenus to join him on a mercenary military venture to Persia, ostensibly to protect the territory of a minor satrap who was under threat.  In fact, though this was not known to Xenophon or Proxenus, the campaign was rather more ambitious than that: it was a game of thrones, nothing less than an assault on the claim of the Persian king Artaxerxes II, by his brother Cyrus the Younger.  The unfolding of this journey into foreign territory, with its adventures and mortal hazards, was a formative event in Xenophon’s life.  In the very first engagement, Cyrus was himself killed.  In a peace parley that followed, the generals of the expeditionary force were executed by treachery, leaving the army stranded, leaderless and surrounded by hostile peoples whose languages they did not speak, and winter was coming.  Xenophon eventually assumed leadership of this stranded and confused army, and led them to safety – as many as survived.  The book which Xenophon later wrote about their harrowing travels ‘up country’, Anabasis, is a hair-raising and brutally graphic soldier’s journal, of which more will be said later.

Upon his return to Greece, Xenophon continued his mercenary work under a Spartan general named Agesilaus.  He even went fighting, with Agesilaus’ “10,000” soldiers who returned from the battle of Coroneia in Persia, against a combined Athenian and Theban force.  Athens issued a decree of exile against Xenophon as a result. .  Even though it is possible that his banishment was revoked in later years, Xenophon never returned to Athens.

In gratitude for his service in this decisive Lacedaimonian victory, the Spartans gave Xenophon an estate in Elis, about 2 miles from Olympia – a region of the Peloponnese which was known for its unparalleled beauty and richness.  Here in Elis over the next 23 years, Xenophon would live a life of semi-retirement and quiet rural pursuits.  Here also he would write the bulk of his works, raise a family, and keep a distanced and reflective historical eye on the political fortunes of Athens. Nothing is known of his wife beyond her name: Philesia.  He had two sons, Gryllus and Diodorus. The Former was killed in the battle of Mantinea in 362 B.C., and Xenophon received many carefully written eulogies, a testament to his prominence in his own time.

When his adoptive city of Sparta was defeated in the Battle of Leuctra in 371 B.C., Elians drove Xenophon from his rural retreat and confiscated it.  Xenophon then moved to “flowery Corinth” where he ended his days.

2. Xenophon’s Socrates

Xenophon’s portrait of Socrates in four loosely topic-organized books is known as Memorabilia.  Any reader who comes across of this work after even a minimal exposure to the better-known Socrates of Plato’s dialogues is in for a shock.  One rare reader who encountered Xenophon’s Socrates first was John Stuart Mill, who refers to it in the context of a description of Mill’s own father:

My father's moral convictions, wholly dissevered from religion, were very much of the character of those of the Greek philosophers; and were delivered with the force and decision which characterized all that came from him. Even at the very early age at which I read with him the Memorabilia of Xenophon, I imbibed from that work and from his comments a deep respect for the character of Socrates; who stood in my mind as a model of ideal excellence: and I well remember how my father at that time impressed upon me the lesson of the "Choice of Hercules."  At a somewhat later period the lofty moral standard exhibited in the writings of Plato operated upon me with great force. (Autobiography, ch.2.)

Xenophon’s Socrates is shown in conversation with various people from a wide variety of walks of life and with quite starkly different moral characters; one of his conversation partners is a famous prostitute, another is an aspiring young politician who knows little about life, another is a son of Pericles, and yet another is a grump; the colorful list goes on.  The individual books of the “Memorabilia” each contain many different conversational vignettes and set pieces, yet they consistently show a Socrates who is above all committed to helping people improve their lives in all practical dimensions; “Socrates was so useful in all circumstances and in all ways…” Memorabilia IV.i.1).  In contrast to Plato’s Socrates, who is committed to “follow the argument wherever, like a wind, it may lead us” (Plato, Republic 394D), Xenophon’s Socrates strives always to send his conversation partners away with some nuggets of practical advice which they may put to use right away.

A brief and selective thematic summary of each book follows:

Memorabilia I:   The book begins with a defense of Socrates against the legal charges which led to his execution, in a long initial section narrated by the author in his own voice.  Socrates enjoined piety and respect for divination, which should be consulted before every momentous life-choice.  He avoided speculation about the nature of the cosmos; “…(h)is own conversation was ever of human things.  The problems he discussed were: what is godly? What is ungodly; what is just, what is unjust; what is prudence; what is madness; what is courage, what is cowardice; what is a state, what is a statesman; what is government, and what is a governor; - these, and others like them…” (Memorabilia.I.1.16).   In a conversation with Aristodemus, Socrates presents an extended ‘argument from design’ to strengthen religious faith; the concept of God here manifested is strikingly monotheistic and is also woven throughout the natural world (Memorabilia I.iv.3-19). To the charge of corrupting the youth, Xenophon writes, “…in control of his own passions and appetites he was the strictest of men” (Memorabilia II.ii.1). (The theme of self-control, both in the sense of restraint of the appetites and in that of autonomy, is strong throughout the Memorabilia.) Socrates “led men up” to self-control, motivated by his love of humanity (Memorabilia I.v, I.2.60).

Memorabilia II:  The theme of self-control is here pursued, and the famous set-piece called “Choice of Herakles” is presented (Memorabilia II.i.21-33), in a version ascribed to Prodicus.  Here, while meditating in a quiet place, the young Herakles is approached by two women who represent the lives of Virtue and Vice respectively.  Each lady tries to persuade Herakles to choose her way, with Vice offering a life of pleasures and self-indulgence, and Virtue offering the rigors of self-control which she argues will lead to true happiness.  (Oddly, the anecdote ends before Herakles chooses.)  There then follows a series of forays into the topic of human relationships as components of the good life; parents give selflessly to their children (a poignant passage describes the tireless work of mothers in particular – Memorabilia II.ii.5); friends are “more useful than any possession”, and are humorously described as being ‘hunted’ and ‘seduced by Siren song’ into one’s life, but the bottom line is that friendship is a good thing based on goodness (Memorabilia II.ii.x).  The value of work as a component of the good life is underscored by a lengthy discussion between Socrates and Aristarchus (Memorabilia II.vii), who has 14 female relatives living under his roof.  Socrates advises him to start a home textile business putting these ladies to work.  They’ll be happier, and work makes for virtue.  This scheme is represented as successful.  (The importance of toil, work, even rough manual labor, to virtue is a continuing theme for Xenophon, and a topic on which his views run counter to the aristocratic mentality of his time.)

Memorabilia III: Here Socrates offers practical advice to several different individuals concerning military leadership and what it takes to become a successful general.  The end goal, he maintains, is to make the soldiers better human beings.  Thus the type of knowledge and expertise required is rather generally found in many different pursuits; even in business (for which one conversation partner has expressed contempt), the goal is the betterment of all individuals concerned; “Don’t look down on business”, Socrates warns (Memorabilia III.iv).  (The idea that there are very general skills which lead to success in a huge variety of human endeavors is a strong theme in Xenophon’s works elsewhere as well.)   General knowledge about human nature and how to be a good leader should combine with the requisite practical knowledge about one’s chosen field, and in all fields moderation and self-control are crucially valuable traits.  Eupraxia, being a good and good-oriented practitioner, is valuable in every field, whether one is a farmer, physician, or politician (Memorabilia III.ix).  In a long set-piece, Socrates is shown visiting a beautiful and famous prostitute named Theodote, and conversing with her about friendship and how to treat one’s friends.  This highly interesting passage, unique in ancient philosophy in presenting a conversation between a working woman (of dubious social standing even!) and a well-known male philosopher, is full of humor and double-entendre but ends with Socrates inviting Theodote to come philosophize with him and his ‘girlfriends’ any time (Memorabilia III.xi).  Finally, Socrates is here something of a fitness guru, advising Epigenes to get out and get some exercise;  “…(t)here is no kind of struggle, apart from war, and no undertaking in which you will be worse off by keeping your body in better fettle” (Memorabilia III.xii.5). (An emphasis on physical fitness achieved through vigorous exercise is a very significant theme throughout Xenophon’s works.)

Memorabilia IV:  The importance of self-control to success in every field of endeavor is again underscored and argued for; talented youths and high-bred horses alike need careful training and structure in order to avoid running off the rails with maturity.  The moral quality of sophrosyne, moderation, prudence, and good habits combined, is said to be most needful in our behavior toward the gods.  For the gods are such benefactors to us that it is asked: How is it possible to be grateful enough?   Socrates offers a translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”, as follows:  a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).  Socrates is described as having the mission of making his companions more law-abiding, more efficacious in their chosen work, more prudent or moderate, and more self-controlled.  Self-control is integral to that precious quality freedom, because no one is free who is ruled by bodily pleasure (Memorabilia IV.v).  This book ends with a beautiful encomium to Socrates spoken in what seems to be Xenophon’s own most authentic voice (Memorabilia IV.viii.11):

All who knew what manner of man Socrates was and who seek after virtue continue to this day to miss him beyond all others, as the chief of helpers in the quest for virtue.  For myself, I have described him as he was: so religious that he did nothing without counsel from the gods; so just that he did no injury, however small, to any man, but conferred the greatest benefits on all who dealt with him…To me then he seemed to be all that a truly good and happy man must be.

In addition to the Memorabilia, Xenophon also wrote a Symposium and an Apology.

Xenophon’s Symposium depicts an avowedly lighthearted group of friends attending a spontaneous dinner-party in honor of young Autolycus’ victory in an Olympic event.  Entertainment is provided by young talent dancing, singing, and performing feats of agility, while the conversation turns on each guest explaining what he values most about himself: beauty, wealth, poverty, friends, and traits of character are all offered and discussed.  Socrates presents his central attribute as the ability to be a “procurer” (essentially, a pimp); he explains that he is able to improve people and make them better, more useful, more valuable to the city, and is in this analogous to a successful pimp who is able to bring out the best in his stable of prostitutes.  In a more serious vein, Socrates explains the superior value of spiritual love over physical love, and the centrality of virtue to genuine love.  “(T)he greatest blessing that befalls the man who yearns to render his favorite a good friend is the necessity of himself making virtue his habitual practice” (Symposium viii.27).  Weirdly, the evening ends with a demonstration of smooching between two of the young musicians which is so hot that everyone rushes off home to his wife (if he has one) or professes the intention to acquire a wife as soon as possible, if he is still single.

Xenophon’s Apology begins with Socrates explaining to his friend Hermogenes why he has not been working on his defense speech: he has been hindered by his divine sign, and moreover is quite ready to die.  Socrates justifies his readiness by noting the evils of old age that he will avoid, and the blamelessness of his life.  When at trial, he defends himself from the charge of impiety by noting his regular participation in all sacrifices and other public religious rituals.  Against the charge of corrupting the youth, he notes that through the oracle at Delphi, “…Apollo answered that no man was more free than I, or more just, or more prudent” (Apology 14).  After his condemnation to death, Socrates comforts his tearful friends with a Stoic-sounding thought:  “Have you not known all along that from the moment of my birth nature had condemned me to death?” (Apology 27). Xenophon concludes in his own voice (Apology 34):

And so, in contemplating the man’s wisdom and nobility of character, I find it beyond my power to forget him or, in remembering him, to refrain from praising him.  And if among those who make virtue their aim any one has ever been brought into contact with a person more helpful than Socrates, I count that man worthy to be called most blessed.

3. Political Philosophy

Xenophon’s political philosophy is a matter of interpretation and some controversy.  Did his relationship with Sparta incline him away from Athenian democratic values?  Was his evident admiration for Persian kings indicative of an allegiance to absolute monarchy?   The main works examined in an effort to reconstruct this aspect of his thought are The Education of Cyrus (also known as Cyropaedia;) a partial biography of a Persian king building an empire, the Anabasis (account of the ill-fated Greek mercenary expedition in Persia), Hiero (a conversation about tyranny), Agesilaus (biography of a Spartan general),the Constitution of the Lacedaimonians (description of the system of laws and social practices of Sparta), and Hellenica (history of Greece from 411 – 362 B.C.E., taking up where Thucydides ends). One thing is clear and beyond controversy: Xenophon has an abiding interest in describing leadership, the constellation of qualities that enables a person to function as a leader in groups, whether military, civic, or familial.

That Xenophon admires the Spartan system and the individuals it produces is evident from both the portrait of Agesilaus and the description of the Spartan political system developed by the legendary  Lycurgus (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians).  Agesilaus is a ferocious military tactician and fighter who waged campaigns in Persia and on Greek soil.  Xenophon gives minute descriptions of the strategies Ageilaus used against the deceptive Persian general Tissaphernes, the successes of which resulted in the latter losing his head (literally).  It is thought that Xenophon was among the soldiers serving under Agesilaus at the battle of Coronea, judging from the immediacy of descriptions like this word picture of the aftermath of this particularly gruesome clash (Agesilaus II.14):

Now that the fighting was at an end, a weird spectacle met the eye, as one surveyed the scene of the conflict – the earth stained with blood, friend and foe lying dead side by side, shields smashed to pieces, spears snapped in two, daggers bared of their sheaths, some on the ground, some embedded in the bodies, some yet gripped by the hand.

What Xenophon admires most about Agesilaus though is the way his character shines through in his leadership (Agesliaus  II. 8).

(H)e took care to render his men capable of meeting all calls on their endurance; he filled their hearts with confidence that they were able to withstand any and every enemy; he inspired them all with an eager determination to out-do one another in valour; and lastly he filled all with anticipation that many good things would befall them, if only they proved good men.  For he believed that men so prepared fight with all their might; nor in point of fact did he deceive himself.

Here is that general who eats with the common soldiers, fights as hard as they do or harder, sleeps on the rudest bed in the battalion, and is tireless in care for their welfare.  Here too, we find Xenophon noting the Spartan’ general’s “love of toil” (he is philoponos, AgesilausIX.3), and the fact that he had fortified his soul “against all the assaults of lucre, of pleasure, and of fear” (Agesilaus VIII.8). Thanks to all of this and more, the Spartan remained a formidable and gnarly opponent into his eighties, and left behind him the best type of monument: the admiration of all who had known him or known of him.

The Constitution of the Lacedaimonians draws a mostly admiring portrait of the creation of distinctively Spartan social customs and military might, by a (probably mythical) genius social engineer named Lycurgus.  Like the inscription over the ant-colony entrance in T. H. White’s The Sword in the Stone, (White 1938, ch.13) “EVERYTHING NOT FORBIDDEN IS COMPULSORY,” Spartan society is legislated down to the most personal details (where men are allowed to eat supper, how much female children get fed, whether an unused horse can be borrowed, etc.) to produce an efficient warrior-making machine in which accumulations of wealth and private property were rendered impossible and the famous “equality’ which made Sparta so stable (in Xenophon’s apparent view at any rate) was forged.   Spartan soldiers were required by law to practice gymnastics while out on campaign, “…and the result is that they take more pride in themselves and have a more dignified appearance than other men” (Constitution of the Lacedaimonians  XII.5).  Extreme measures are taken with young boys, to ensure that they will develop the proper level of discipline and collectivist thinking that will produce obedient and happily equal adult citizens: they are taken from their homes at age 7 and from thenceforth live in military-like barracks, subject to discipline by any adult male who might see them transgress in any way.

Should we infer that Xenophon endorses this radical social engineering program and its collectivist political philosophy, or only that he finds it a fascinating and impressive experiment which did in fact make Sparta the most feared military force in the Greek world of its time?   Whichever interpretation we choose, it is clear at the end of the treatise that the experiment was not a lasting and unambiguous success; Xenophon writes that Spartan citizens have in fact gone over to the accumulation of individual wealth, have grown fond of wielding power over remote cities, and have lost that unanimity which was Lycurgus’ energetically-sought goal.

Did Xenophon provide an answer to the question about an Ideal Polis, a most desirable form of political organization?  Some scholars have argued that we can look for glimmerings of this in the Anabasis, where the Greek army in its struggle to reach the sea can be viewed as a “polis on the move” (Waterfield 2006, p.147).  As the shattered mercenary troops struggle to stay organized and to survive their pitiless march through the foodless deserts of Assyria and the freezing mountains of Armenia, various forms of political organization surface at various times.  While an army is most naturally understood as an oligarchy, with orders coming from a few and being followed by the many, there are also moments of democracy: soldiers hold general assemblies and agree upon resolutions which they will represent to their commanding officers.  Xenophon himself is elected by popular acclaim early in the march.  As leader, he keeps his eye on the welfare of the troops: defusing anarchy, strategically seeking out food and safety, and making the tough decisions necessary for the good of all, such as abandoning the camp followers and horses in deep mountain snow when it became clear they were a mortal liability.  During its course, Xenophon emphasizes the importance of piety and ritual which bind a polis together in homonoia or like-mindedness.  At the climactic moment when the lead troops crest a rise and spot the sea, immediately after dancing for joy and famously shouting, “Thalatta!  Thalatta!” (the sea, the sea), they build a cairn of stones to honor the gods.

The political philosophies which can be discerned in Xenophon’s largest and perhaps strangest work, The Education of Cyrus, are a matter of great controversy.  Some paradoxical aspects of the work fuel the arguments about how it should be interpreted.  Cyrus is undoubtedly a terrific leader and a daunting empire-builder, but he is seen to have some off-putting traits such as arrogance, a tendency to fear his own sensuality, and questionable judgment from time to time.  Does this mean Xenophon is implicitly criticizing the Persian model of monarchy?  Yet he takes pains, in this massive book, to show Cyrus’ uncanny ability to mobilize support and suppress resistance, and his dedication to both recognizing and rewarding nobility and virtue.  Cyrus is repeatedly seen to emphasize that the best army consists of soldiers serving of their own free will, being rewarded for their merits, and feeling respect and gratitude to their leaders.

They came not from compulsion but from their own free will, and out of gratitude.  (Cyropaedia  IV.iii.11)

Perhaps we should conclude that Xenophon’s political theory is flexible, and that the most key element of any polis revolves around the leadership skills of those in charge, alongside their self-control and devotion to the good of the whole.

4. Moral Philosophy

As seen above in the discussion of Xenophon’s Socrates and of the ideal leader, certain themes recur in Xenophon’s moral reflections. Some of the most frequently recurring ideas are:

  1.  The importance of self-control: Sophrosyne, self-control, moderation, restraint of appetite, and balance, comprises one of the cardinal virtues of Greek popular morality, and it is highlighted by Xenophon in many ways.  Socrates is often said to have exemplified it in the highest degree.  Cyrus displays it when (Cyropaedia V.i-VII.iii) he is invited to look upon the most beautiful woman in Asia, who happens to be his prisoner of war. He firmly declines this temptation; his general Araspas by contrast stares at her endlessly, falls in lust, insults her honor and ignites a chain of events that ends in her suicide over her husband’s corpse.
  2. A demanding work-ethic:  Hard work makes for virtue in several ways.  It conduces to health, it results in earned rewards, it keeps us off the streets of temptation, and builds character.   In the Oeconomicus, a treatise on household management, Xenophon tells the story of a visit paid by a Greek ambassador to Cyrus the Persian king in his royal gardens.  Cyrus astounds the Greek by stating that he himself laid out the garden plan and works in it regularly. Cyrus continues (Oeconomicus IV.24),
  3. "I never yet sat down to dinner when in sound health, without first working hard at some task of war or agriculture, or exerting myself somehow."
  4. The Greek replies, “I think you deserve your happiness, Cyrus, for you earn it by your virtue”.
  5. An ideal of service: It is impossible to miss this emphasis in Xenophon’s remembrances of Socrates, “…so useful in all circumstances and in all ways” (Memorabilia IV.i.1).  Socrates can frequently be seen offering practical help, life advice, and moral guidance to friends and total strangers.  Indeed Xenophon’s Socrates resembles an uncompensated life-coach in marked ways.  Do you have lots of ‘friends’ but suspect they just want something from you? Be more discerning and take better care of your real friends; then friendships will be on a more solid footing (advice to a prostitute; MemorabiliaII.xi).  Do you over-react to other peoples’ rudeness?  Adjust your attitude; it’s not always about you (MemorabiliaIII.xiii).  Feuding with your brother?  Study the natural world and observe that animals reared together feel a yearning for each other’s company; love between brothers is more natural than discord (Memorabilia II.iii.4).
  6. A certain utilitarianism: The best actions are the most practically beneficial for all.  In Xenophon there is nothing of the soul’s solitary winged journey toward fulfillment in transcendence.  Goodness is good for the here and now, and good for the city, or the army, or the whole farm.  Eupraxia, doing well and doing things beneficially, is of the highest value.
  7. A certain egalitarianism: Although Xenophon was no feminist, he does present the idea that the wife who is a full partner in household management contributes as much to the welfare of the estate as does her husband (Oeconomicus III.15).  Wives and husbands should be co-workers in the household (Oeconomicus III.x).  And he gives to Socrates these memorable lines about how hard it is to be a mother of small children, a passage unique in classical literature (Memorabilia II.ii.5):

The woman conceives and bears her burden in travail, risking her life, and giving of her own food; and, with much labor, having endured to the end and brought forth her child, she rears and cares for it, although she has not received any good thing, and the babe neither recognizes its benefactress nor can make its wants known to her; still she guesses what is good for it, and what it likes, and seeks to supply these things, and rears it for a long season, enduring toil day and night, nothing knowing what return she will get.

He writes admiringly of the general who eats with his men and eats the same food, of the king who works in his garden, of Socrates chatting with a prostitute, of the virtue of Panthea and her noble death (Cyropaedia VII.iii.14).  He admires the Spartan ideal of equality and laments its erosion.

5. Practical Treatises

  Xenophon’s collected works include several shorter dialogues and essays in which he (like his Socrates) provides useful and practically applicable advice on topics like choosing and training a war-horse (On Horsemanship), being a cavalry commander (The Cavalry Commander),  hunting (On Hunting), taxation (Ways and Means), and home economics (Oeconomicus).  These treatises are not flatly how-to manuals but also are infused with a distinctive world-view and a definite value-scheme.

So for example, in the treatise on horsemanship, Xenophon presents a definite equine psychology and a training ethic; the training should not be harsh, because “…nothing forced can ever be beautiful”.  The horse

must follow the indication of the aids to display of his own free will all the most beautiful and brilliant qualities (On Horsemanship XI.6).

Xenophon stresses commonalities between horses and humans.   Old saws apply equally to horses and to humans, as in the following text concerning the length of galloping sets: “In excess of the proper limit, nothing whatsoever is enjoyable, either to a horse or a man” (X.14).  It is noticeable that Xenophon does not simply say that running a horse ragged is counterproductive in training.  His point differs from this claim in two ways: he stresses again the commonality between horse and human; and he places the emphasis of the training advice upon what is pleasing (‘edu) to the horse.  Thus the horse is conceived as a partner, rather than an object, in the training project, and a partner whose willing and appreciative participation in the project is essential to its success.

So also, in the Oeconomicus, there is not simply practical instruction about running a successful small farm, but a general theme of praise for engagement, orderliness, and system that has sometimes a definite political ring, as in the following passage (Oeconomicus V.i):

For the pursuit of (farming) is in some sense a luxury as well as a means of increasing one’s estate and of training the body in all that a free man should be able to do.

Sometimes however it just sounds quaint; “What a beautiful sight is afforded by boots of all sorts arranged in rows!” (Oeconomicus VIII.19).

Thus, Xenophon’s philosophical projects were infused with a commitment to practical usefulness just as his practical treatises convey a philosophy that is still of interest today, with its emphasis on engagement in the world, on knowing who we are and how we can help.   Recall Socrates’ translation of the Delphic oracle’s inscription, “Know thyself”; a person should “…consider what sort of a creature he is for human use and get to know his own powers” (Memorabilia IV.ii.25).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, J.K., 2001, Xenophon, Bristol, U.K.: Bristol Classical.
  • Brickhouse, T., 2002, The trial and execution of Socrates: sources and controversies, New York : Oxford University Press.
  • Bruell, C., “Xenophon”, in History of Political Philosophy, ed. L. Strauss and J. Cropsey, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987, 89-117.
  • Buzzetti, E., 2001, “The Rhetoric of Xenophon and the Treatment of Justice in the Memorabilia”, in Interpretation 29.1: 3-35.
  • Cooper, J., 1999, "Notes on Xenophon's Socrates”, in Cooper, J., Reason and Emotion: Essays on Ancient Moral Psychology and Ethical Theory, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press: 3-28.
  • Danzig, G. 2005, “Intra-Socratic Polemics: The Symposia of Plato and Xenophon”, in Greek, Roman, and Byzantine Studies 45: 331-357.
  • Dillery, John, 1995, Xenophon and the History of his Times, New York: Routledge.
  • Dorion, Louis-Andre, 2010, “The Straussian Exegesis of Xenophon: The Paradigmatic Case of Memorabilia IV 4”, in V. Gray. (ed.) Xenophon: Oxford Readings in Classical Studies, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 283-323.
  • Fox, R.L. (ed.), 2004, The Long March: Xenophon and the Ten Thousand, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Gray, V., 1998, The Framing of Socrates: The Literary Interpretation of Xenophon’s Memorabilia, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Gray, V. (ed.), 2010, Xenophon: Oxford Readings in Classical Studies, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Higgins, W. 1977, Xenophon the Athenian: the problem of the individual and the society of the polis, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Howland, J., 2000, “Xenophon’s Philosophical Odyssey: On the Anabasis and Plato’s Republic”, in American Political Science Review, 94.4: 875-889.
  • Johnson, D. , 2003, “Xenophon’s Socrates on Justice and the Law”, in Ancient Philosophy, 23: 255-281.
  • Judson, L. and Karasmanis, V. (edd.), 2006, Remembering Socrates, Oxford: Clarendon Press; New York : Oxford University Press
  • Nadon, C., 2001, Xenophon’s Prince: Republic and Empire in the Cyropaedia, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • O’Connor, David K., 1994, “The Erotic Self-Sufficiency of Socrates: A Reading of Xenophon’s Memorabilia”, in The Socratic Movement ed. P. A. Vander Waerdt; Ithaca NY: Cornell University Press, 150-180.
  • Pangle, T.L., 1994, “Socrates in the Context of Xenophon’s Political Writings”, in P. A. Van Der Waerdt (ed.) , The Socratic Movement, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 2004: 127-150.
  • Pomeroy, S. 1994, Xenophon: Oeconomicus, A Social and Historical Commentary, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Sandridge, Norman B., 2012, Loving Humanity, Learning, and Being Honored: The Foundations of Leadership in Xenophon’s Education of Cyrus, Washington D.C.: Center for Hellenic Studies.
  • Sandridge, Norman B., 2012: webmaster for an online commentary on Cyropaedia (an international and ongoing collaborative scholarly project) at
  • Seager, R., 2001, “Xenophon and Athenian Democratic Ideology”, in Classical Quarterly, 51.2: 385-397.
  • Strauss, L., 1948, On Tyranny, Glencoe, IL: The Free Press.
  • Tatum, J., 1989, Xenophon’s Imperial Fiction, Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Tuplin, C. (ed.), 2004, Xenophon and his World, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Van Der Waerdt, P. A. ed.1994, The Socratic Movement, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Vlastos, G, 1991, "The Evidence of Aristotle and Xenophon" In Vlastos, Socrates: Ironist and Moral Philosopher, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 81-106.
  • Waterfield, R. , 2006, Xenophon’s Retreat: Greece, Persia, and the End of the Golden Age, London: Faber and Faber.
  • Waterfield, R., 2004, “Xenophon’s Socratic Mission” in Chirstopher Tuplin (ed.) Xenophon and His World, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 79-113.


Author Information

Eve A. Browning
University of Minnesota Duluth
U. S. A.

Musonius Rufus (c. 30–62 C.E.)

Gaius Musonius Rufus was one of the four great Stoic philosophers of the Roman empire, along with Seneca, Epictetus, and Marcus Aurelius. Renowned as a great Stoic teacher, Musonius conceived of philosophy as nothing but the practice of noble behavior. He advocated a commitment to live for virtue, not pleasure, since virtue saves us from the mistakes that ruin life. Though philosophy is more difficult to learn than other subjects, it is more important because it corrects the errors in thinking that lead to errors in acting. He also called for austere personal habits, including the simplest vegetarian diet, and minimal, inexpensive garments and footwear, in order to achieve a good, sturdy life in accord with the principles of Stoicism. He believed that philosophy must be studied not to cultivate brilliance in arguments or an excessive cleverness, but to develop good character, a sound mind, and a tough, healthy body. Musonius condemned all luxuries and disapproved of sexual activity outside of marriage. He argued that women should receive the same education in philosophy as men, since the virtues are the same for both sexes. He praised the married life with lots of children. He affirmed Stoic orthodoxy in teaching that neither death, injury, insult, pain, poverty, nor exile is to be feared since none of them are evils.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Teachings
  3. Philosophy, Philosophers, and Virtue
  4. Food and Frugality
  5. Women and Equal Education
  6. Sex, Marriage, Family, and Old Age
  7. Impact
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gaius Musonius Rufus was born before 30 C.E. in Volsinii, an Etruscan city of Italy, as a Roman eques (knight), the class of aristocracy ranked second only to senators. He was a friend of Rubellius Plautus, whom emperor Nero saw as a threat. When Nero banished Rubellius around 60 C.E., Musonius accompanied him into exile in Asia Minor. After Rubellius died in 62 C.E. Musonius returned to Rome, where he taught and practiced Stoicism, which roused the suspicion of Nero. On discovery of the great conspiracy against Nero, led by Calpurnius Piso in 65 C.E., Nero banished Musonius to the arid, desolate island of Gyaros in the Aegean Sea. He returned to Rome under the reign of Galba in 68 C.E. and tried to advocate peace to the Flavian army approaching Rome. In 70 C.E. Musonius secured the conviction of the philosopher Publius Egnatius Celer, who had betrayed Barea Soranus, a friend of Rubellius Plautus. Musonius was exiled a second time, by Vespasian, but returned to Rome in the reign of Titus. Musonius was highly respected and had a considerable following during his life. He died before 101-2 C.E.

2. Teachings

Either Musonius wrote nothing himself, or what he did write is lost, because none of his own writings survive. His philosophical teachings survive as thirty-two apophthegms (pithy sayings) and twenty-one longer discourses, all apparently preserved by others and all in Greek, except for Aulus Gellius’ testimonia in Latin. For this reason, it is likely that he lectured in Greek. Musonius favored a direct and concise style of instruction. He taught that the teacher of philosophy should not present many arguments but rather should offer a few, clear, practical arguments oriented to his listener and couched in terms known to be persuasive to that listener.

3. Philosophy, Philosophers, and Virtue

Musonius believed that (Stoic) philosophy was the most useful thing. Philosophy persuades us, according to Stoic teaching, that neither life, nor wealth, nor pleasure is a good, and that neither death, nor poverty, nor pain is an evil; thus the latter are not to be feared. Virtue is the only good because it alone keeps us from making errors in living. Moreover, it is only the philosopher who seems to make a study of virtue. The person who claims to be studying philosophy must practice it more diligently than the person studying medicine or some other skill, because philosophy is more important, and more difficult to understand, than any other pursuit. This is because, unlike other skills, people who study philosophy have been corrupted in their souls with vices and thoughtless habits by learning things contrary to what they will learn in philosophy. But the philosopher does not study virtue just as theoretical knowledge. Rather, Musonius insists that practice is more important than theory, as practice more effectively leads us to action than theory. He held that though everyone is naturally disposed to live without error and has the capacity to be virtuous, someone who has not actually learned the skill of virtuous living cannot be expected to live without error any more than someone who is not a trained doctor, musician, scholar, helmsman, or athlete could be expected to practice those skills without error.

In one of his lectures Musonius recounts the advice he offered to a visiting Syrian king. A king must protect and help his subjects, so a king must know what is good or bad, helpful or harmful, useful or useless for people. But to diagnose these things is precisely the philosopher’s job. Since a king must also know what justice is and make just decisions, a king must study philosophy. A king must possess self-control, frugality, modesty, courage, wisdom, magnanimity, the ability to prevail in speech over others, the ability to endure pain, and must be free of error. Philosophy, Musonius argued, is the only art that provides all such virtues. To show his gratitude the king offered him anything he wanted, to which Musonius asked only that the king adhere to the principles set forth.

Musonius held that since a human being is made of body and soul, we should train both, but the latter demands greater attention. This dual method requires becoming accustomed to cold, heat, thirst, hunger, scarcity of food, a hard bed, abstaining from pleasures, and enduring pains. This method strengthens the body, inures it to suffering, and makes it fit for every task. He believed that the soul is similarly strengthened by developing courage through enduring hardships, and by making it self-controlled through abstaining from pleasures. Musonius insisted that exile, poverty, physical injury, and death are not evils and a philosopher must scorn all such things. A philosopher regards being beaten, jeered at, or spat upon as neither injurious nor shameful and so would never litigate against anyone for any such acts, according to Musonius. He argued that since we acquire all good things by pain, the person who refuses to endure pain all but condemns himself to not being worthy of anything good.

Musonius criticized cooks and chefs while defending farming as a suitable occupation for a philosopher and no obstacle to learning or teaching essential lessons.

4. Food and Frugality

Musonius’ extant teachings emphasize the importance of daily practices. For example, he emphasized that what one eats has significant consequences. He believed that mastering one’s appetites for food and drink is the basis for self-control, a vital virtue. He argued that the purpose of food is to nourish and strengthen the body and to sustain life, not to provide pleasure. Digesting our food gives us no pleasure, he reasoned, and the time spent digesting food far exceeds the time spent consuming it. It is digestion which nourishes the body, not consumption. Therefore, he concluded, the food we eat serves its purpose when we’re digesting it, not when we’re tasting it.

The proper diet, according to Musonius, was lacto-vegetarian. These foods are least expensive and most readily available: raw fruits in season, certain raw vegetables, milk, cheese, and honeycombs. Cooked grains and some cooked vegetables are also suitable for humans, whereas a meat-based diet is too crude for human beings and is more suitable for wild beasts. Those who eat relatively large amounts of meat seemed slow-witted to Musonius.

We are worse than brute animals when it comes to food, he thought, because we are obsessed with embellishing how our food is presented and fuss about what we eat and how we prepare it merely to amuse our palates. Moreover, too much rich food harms the body. For these reasons, Musonius thought that gastronomic pleasure is undoubtedly the most difficult pleasure to combat. He consequently rejected gourmet cuisine and delicacies as a dangerous habit. He judged gluttony and craving gourmet food to be most shameful and to show a lack of moderation. Indeed, Musonius was of the opinion that those who eat the least expensive food can work harder, are the least fatigued by working, become sick less often, tolerate cold, heat, and lack of sleep better, and are stronger, than those who eat expensive food. He concluded that responsible people favor what is easy to obtain over what is difficult, what involves no trouble over what does, and what is available over what isn’t. These preferences promote self-control and goodness.

Musonius advocated a similarly austere philosophy about clothes. The purpose of our clothes and footwear is strictly protection from the elements. So clothes and shoes should be modest and inexpensive, not attract the attention of the foolish. One should dress to strengthen and toughen the body, not to bundle up in many layers so as never to experience cold and heat and make the body soft and sensitive. Musonius recommended dressing to feel somewhat cold in the winter and avoiding shade in the summer. If possible, he advised, go shoeless.

The purpose of houses, he believed, was to protect us from the elements, to keep out cold, excessive heat, and the wind. Our dwelling should protect us and our food the way a cave would. Money should be spent both publicly and privately on people, not on elaborate buildings or fancy décor. Beds or tables of ivory, silver, or gold, hard-to-get textiles, cups of gold, silver, or marble—all such furnishings are entirely unnecessary and shamefully extravagant. Items that are expensive to acquire, hard to use, troublesome to clean, difficult to guard, or impractical, are inferior when compared with inexpensive, useful, and practical items made of cast iron, plain ceramic, wood, and the like. Thoughtless people covet expensive furnishings they wrongly believe are good and noble. He said he would rather be sick than live in luxury, because illness harms only the body, whereas living in luxury harms both the body and the soul. Luxury makes the body weak and soft and the soul undisciplined and cowardly. Musonius judged that luxurious living fosters unvarnished injustice and greed, so it must be completely avoided.

For the ancient Roman philosophers, following their Greek predecessors, the beard was the badge of a philosopher. Musonius said that a man should cut the hair on his scalp the way he prunes vines, by removing only what is useless and bothersome. The beard, on the other hand, should not be shaved, he insisted, because (1) nature provides it to protect a man’s face, and (2) the beard is the emblem of manhood, the human equivalent of the cock’s comb and the lion’s mane. Hair should never be trimmed to beautify or to please women or boys. Hair is no more trouble for men than feathers are for birds, Musonius said. Consequently, shaving or fastidiously trimming one’s beard were acts of emasculation.

5. Women and Equal Education

Musonius supported his belief that women ought to receive the same education in philosophy as men with the following arguments. First, the gods have given women the same power of reason as men. Reason considers whether an action is good or bad, honorable or shameful. Second, women have the same senses as men: sight, hearing, smell, and the rest. Third, the sexes share the same parts of the body: head, torso, arms, and legs. Fourth, women have an equal desire for virtue and a natural affinity for it. Women, no less than men, are by nature pleased by noble, just deeds and censure their opposites. Therefore, Musonius concluded, it is just as appropriate for women to study philosophy, and thereby to consider how to live honorably, as it is for men.

Moreover, he reasoned, a woman must be able to manage an estate, to account for things beneficial to it, and to supervise the household staff. A woman must also have self-control. She must be free from sexual improprieties and must exercise self-control over other pleasures. She must neither be a slave to desires, nor quarrelsome, nor extravagant, nor vain. A self-controlled woman, Musonius believed, controls her anger, is not overcome by grief, and is stronger than every emotion. But these are the character traits of a beautiful person, whether male or female.

Musonius argued that a woman who studies philosophy would be just, a blameless partner in life, a good and like-minded co-worker, a careful guardian of husband and children, and completely free from the love of gain and greed. She would regard it worse to do wrong than to be wronged, and worse to take more than one’s share than to suffer loss. No one, Musonius insisted, would be more just than she. Moreover, a philosophic woman would love her children more than her own life. She would not hesitate to fight to protect her children any more than a hen that fights with predators much larger than she is to protect her chicks.

He considered it appropriate for an educated woman to be more courageous than an uneducated woman and for a woman trained in philosophy to be more courageous than one untrained in philosophy. Musonius noted that the tribe of Amazons conquered many people with weapons, thus demonstrating that women are fully capable of courageously participating in armed conflict. He thought it appropriate for the philosophic woman not to submit to anything shameful out of fear of death or pain. Nor is it appropriate for her to bow down to anyone, whether well-born, powerful, wealthy, or even a tyrant. Musonius saw the philosophic woman as holding the same beliefs as the Stoic man: she thinks nobly, does not judge death to be an evil, nor life to be a good, nor shrinks from pain, nor pursues lack of pain above all else. Musonius thought it likely that this kind of woman would be self-motivated and persevering, would breast-feed her children, serve her husband with her own hands, and do without hesitation tasks which some regard as appropriate for slaves. Thus, he judged that a woman like this would be a great advantage for her husband, a source of honor for her kinfolk, and a good example for the women who know her.

Musonius believed that sons and daughters should receive the same education, since those who train horses and dogs train both the males and the females the same way. He rejected the view that there is one type of virtue for men and another for women. Women and men have the same virtues and so must receive the same education in philosophy.

When it comes to certain tasks, on the other hand, Musonius was less egalitarian. He believed that the nature of males is stronger and that of females is weaker, and so the most suitable tasks ought to be assigned to each nature accordingly. In general, men should be assigned the heavier tasks (e.g. gymnastics and being outdoors), women the lighter tasks (e.g. spinning yarn and being indoors). Sometimes, however, special circumstances—such as a health condition—would warrant men undertaking some of the lighter tasks which seem to be suited for women, and women in turn undertaking some of the harder ones which seem more suited for men. Thus, Musonius concludes that no chores have been exclusively reserved for either sex. Both boys and girls must receive the same education about what is good and what is bad, what is helpful and what is harmful. Shame towards everything base must be instilled in both sexes from infancy on. Musonius’ philosophy of education dictated that both males and females must be accustomed to endure toil, and neither to fear death nor to become dejected in the face of any misfortune.

6. Sex, Marriage, Family, and Old Age

Musonius’ opposition to luxurious living extended to his views about sex. He thought that men who live luxuriously desire a wide variety of sexual experiences, both legitimate and illegitimate, with both women and men. He remarked that sometimes licentious men pursue a series of male sex-partners. Sometimes they grow dissatisfied with available male sex-partners and choose to pursue those who are hard to get. Musonius condemned all such recreational sex acts. He insisted that only those sex acts aimed at procreation within marriage are right. He decried adultery as unlawful and illegitimate. He judged homosexual relationships as an outrage contrary to nature. He argued that anyone overcome by shameful pleasure is base in his lack of self-control, and so blamed the man (married or unmarried) who has sex with his own female slave as much as the woman (married or unmarried) who has sex with her male slave.

Musonius argued that there must be companionship and mutual care of husband and wife in marriage since its chief end is to live together and have children. Spouses should consider all things as common possessions and nothing as private, not even the body itself. But since procreation can result from sexual relations outside of marriage, childbirth cannot be the only motive for marriage. Musonius thought that when each spouse competes to surpass the other in giving complete care, the partnership is beautiful and admirable. But when a spouse considers only his or her own interests and neglects the other's needs and concerns, their union is destroyed and their marriage cannot help but go poorly. Such a couple either splits up or their relationship becomes worse than solitude.

Musonius advised those planning to marry not to worry about finding partners from noble or wealthy families or those with beautiful bodies. Neither wealth, nor beauty, nor noble birth promotes a sense of partnership or harmony, nor do they facilitate procreation. He judged bodies that are healthy, normal in form, and able to function on their own, and souls that are naturally disposed towards self-control, justice, and virtue, as most fit for marriage.

Since he held that marriage is obviously in accordance with nature, Musonius rejected the objection that being married gets in the way of studying philosophy. He cited Pythagoras, Socrates, and Crates as examples of married men who were fine philosophers. To think that each should look only to his own affairs is to think that a human being is no different from a wolf or any other wild beast whose nature is to live by force and greed. Wild animals spare nothing they can devour, they have no companions, they never work together, and they have no share in anything just, according to Musonius. He supposed that human nature is very much like that of bees, who are unable to live alone and die when isolated. Bees work and act together. Wicked people are unjust and savage and have no concern for a neighbor in trouble. Virtuous people are good, just, and kind, and show love for their fellow human beings and concern for their neighbors. Marriage is the way for a person to create a family to provide the well-being of the city. Therefore, Musonius judged that anyone who deprives people of marriage destroys family, city, and the entire human race. He reasoned that this is because humans would cease to exist if there were no procreation, and there would be no just and lawful procreation without marriage. He concluded that marriage is important and serious because great gods (Hera, Eros, Aphrodite) govern it.

Musonius opined that the bigger a family, the better. He thought that having many children is beneficial and profitable for cities while having few or none is harmful. Consequently, he praised the wise lawgivers who forbade women from agreeing to be childless and from preventing conception, who enacted punishment for women who induced miscarriages, who punished married couples who were childless, and who honored married couples with many children. He reasoned that just as the man with many friends is mightier than the man without friends, the father with many children is much mightier than the man who has few or none. Musonius was very impressed by the spectacle of a husband or wife with their many children crowded around them. He believed that no procession for the gods and no sacred ritual is as beautiful to behold, or as worthy of being witnessed, as a chorus of many children leading their parents through the city. Musonius scolded those who offered poverty as an excuse for not raising many children. He was outraged by the well-off or affluent refusing to raise children who are born later so that the earlier-born may be better off. Musonius believed that it was an unholy act to deprive the earlier-born of siblings to increase their inheritance. He thought it much better to have many siblings than to have many possessions. Possessions invite plots from neighbors. Possessions need protection. Siblings, he taught, are one’s greatest protectors. Musonius opined that the man who enjoys the blessing of many loyal brothers is most worthy of emulation and most beloved by the gods.

When asked whether one’s parents should be obeyed in all matters, Musonius answered as follows. If a father, who was neither a doctor nor knowledgeable about health and sickness, ordered his sick son to take something he believed would help, but which would in fact be useless, or even harmful, and the sick son, knowing this, did not comply with his father’s order, the son would not be acting disobediently. Similarly, if the father was ill and asked for wine or inappropriate food that would worsen his illness if consumed, and the son, knowing better, refused to give them to his ill father, the son would not be acting disobediently. Even less disobedient, Musonius argued, is the son who refuses to steal or embezzle money entrusted to him when his greedy father commands it. The lesson is that refusing to do what one ought not to do merits praise, not blame. The disobedient person disobeys orders that are right, honorable, and beneficial, and acts shamefully in doing so. But to refuse to obey a shameful, blameworthy command of a parent is just and blameless. The obedient person obeys only his parent’s good, appropriate advice, and obeys all of such advice. The law of Zeus orders us to be good, and being good is the same thing as being a philosopher, Musonius taught.

He argued that the best thing to have on hand during old age is living in accord with nature, the definitive goal of life according to the Stoics. Human nature, he thought, can be better understood by comparing it to the nature of other animals. Horses, dogs, and cows are all inferior to human beings. We do not consider a horse to reach its potential by merely eating, drinking, mating without restraint, and doing none of the things suitable for a horse. Nor do we regard a dog as reaching its potential if it merely indulges in all sorts of pleasures while doing none of the things for which dogs are thought to be good. Nor would any other animal reach its potential by being glutted with pleasures but failing to function in a manner appropriate to its species. Hence, no animal comes into existence for pleasure. The nature of each animal determines the virtue characteristic of it. Nothing lives in accord with nature except what demonstrates its virtue through the actions which it performs in accord with its own nature. Therefore, Musonius concluded, the nature of human beings is to live for virtue; we did not come into existence for the sake of pleasure. Those who live for virtue deserve praise, can rightly think well of themselves, and can be hopeful, courageous, cheerful, and joyful. The human being, Musonius taught, is the only creature on earth that is the image of the divine. Since we have the same virtues as the gods, he reasoned, we cannot imagine better virtues than intelligence, justice, courage, and self-control. Therefore, a god, since he has these virtues, is stronger than pleasure, greed, desire, envy, and jealousy. A god is magnanimous and both a benefactor to, and a lover of, human beings. Consequently, Musonius reasoned, inasmuch as a human being is a copy of a god, a human being must be considered to be like a god when he acts in accord with nature. The life of a good man is the best life, and death is its end. Musonius thought that wealth is no defense against old age because wealth lets people enjoy food, drink, sex, and other pleasures, but never supplies contentment to a wealthy person nor banishes his grief. Therefore, the good man lives without regret, and according to nature by accepting death fearlessly and boldly in his old age, living happily and honorably till the end.

7. Impact

Musonius seems to have acted as an advisor to his friends the Stoic martyrs Rubellius Plautus, Barea Soranus, and Thrasea. Musonius’ son-in-law Artemidorus was judged by Pliny to be the greatest of the philosophers of his day, and Pliny himself professed admiration for Musonius. Musonius’ pupils and followers include Fundanus, the eloquent philosopher Euphrates of Tyre, Timocrates of Heracleia, Athenodotus (the teacher of Marcus Cornelius Fronto), and the golden-tongued orator Dio of Prusa. His greatest student was Epictetus, who mentions him several times in The Discourses of Epictetus written by Epictetus’ student Arrian. Epictetus’ philosophy was deeply influenced by Musonius.

After his death Musonius was admired by philosophers and theologians alike. The Stoic Hierocles and the Christian apologist Clement of Alexandria were strongly influenced by Musonius. Roman emperor Julian the Apostate said that Musonius became famous because he endured his sufferings with courage and sustained with firmness the cruelty of tyrants. Dio of Prusa judged that Musonius enjoyed a reputation greater than any one man had attained for generations and that he was the man who, since the time of the ancients, had lived most nearly in conformity with reason. The Greek sophist Philostratus declared that Musonius was unsurpassed in philosophic ability.

8. References and Further Reading

  • King, Cynthia (trans.). Musonius Rufus. Lectures and Sayings. CreateSpace, 2011.
  • Lutz, Cora E. Musonius Rufus: “The Roman Socrates”. Yale Classical Studies 10: 3-147. New Haven: Yale Univ., 1947.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. "The Incomplete Feminism of Musonius Rufus, Platonist, Stoic, and Roman," in The Sleep of Reason. Erotic Experience and Sexual Ethics in Ancient Greece and Rome. Ed. M. C. Nussbaum and J. Sihvola. Chicago: Univ. of Chicago, 2002.
  • van Geytenbeek, A. C. 1963. Musonius Rufus and Greek Diatribe. Rev. ed. trans. B. L. Hijmans, Jr. New York: Humanities Press, 1963.

Author Information

William O. Stephens
Creighton University
U. S. A.

Plato: The Republic

PlatoSince the mid-nineteenth century, the Republic has been Plato’s most famous and widely read dialogue.  As in most other Platonic dialogues the main character is Socrates.  It is generally accepted that the Republic belongs to the dialogues of Plato’s middle period.  In Plato’s early dialogues, Socrates refutes the accounts of his interlocutors and the discussion ends with no satisfactory answer to the matter investigated.  In the Republic however, we encounter Socrates developing a position on justice and its relation to eudaimonia (happiness).  He provides a long and complicated, but unified argument, in defense of the just life and its necessary connection to the happy life.

The dialogue explores two central questions.  The first question is “what is justice?”  Socrates addresses this question both in terms of political communities and in terms of the individual person or soul.  He does this to address the second and driving question of the dialogue: “is the just person happier than the unjust person?” or “what is the relation of justice to happiness?” Given the two central questions of the discussion, Plato’s philosophical concerns in the dialogue are ethical and political.  In order to address these two questions, Socrates and his interlocutors construct a just city in speech, the Kallipolis.  They do this in order to explain what justice is and then they proceed to illustrate justice by analogy in the human soul.  On the way to defending the just life, Socrates considers a tremendous variety of subjects such as several rival theories of justice, competing views of human happiness, education, the nature and importance of philosophy and philosophers, knowledge, the structure of reality, the Forms, the virtues and vices, good and bad souls, good and bad political regimes, the family, the role of women in society, the role of art in society, and even the afterlife.  This wide scope of the dialogue presents various interpretative difficulties and has resulted in thousands of scholarly works.  In order to attempt to understand the dialogue’s argument as a whole one is required to grapple with these subjects.

Table of Contents

  1. Synopsis of the Republic
    1. Book I
    2. Book II
    3. Book III
    4. Book IV
    5. Book V
    6. Book VI
    7. Book VII
    8. Book VIII
    9. Book IX
    10. Book X
  2. Ethics or Political Philosophy?
  3. The Analogy of the City and the Soul
  4. Plato’s Defense of Justice
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Standard Greek Text
    2. English Translations
    3. General Discussions of the Republic
    4. Discussions on Plato’s Ethics and Political Philosophy
    5. Discussions on the City/Soul Analogy.
    6. Discussions of Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic
    7. Discussions of Political Measures Introduced in the Just City
      1. Discussions of the Role of Women in the Just City
      2. Discussions of Poetry in the Just City
      3. Discussions on the Soul in the Republic
      4. Discussions on Plato’s Moral Psychology in the Republic

1. Synopsis of the Republic

a. Book I

Socrates and Glaucon visit the Piraeus to attend a festival in honor of the Thracian goddess Bendis (327a).  They are led to Polemarchus’ house (328b).  Socrates speaks to Cephalus about old age, the benefits of being wealthy, and justice (328e-331d). One would not claim that it is just to return weapons one owes to a mad friend (331c), thus justice is not being truthful and returning what one owes as Cephalus claims.  The discussion between Socrates and Polemarchus follows (331d-336b).

Polemarchus claims that justice is helping one’s friends and harming one’s enemies and that this is what one owes people (332c).  Socrates’ objections to Polemarchus’ definition are as follows: (i) Is this appropriate in medicine or cooking?  So in what context is this the case? (332d)? (ii) The just person will also be good at useless things and at being unjust (333e). (iii) We often do not know who our friends and enemies are. Thus, we may treat those whom we only think are our friends or enemies well or badly.  Would this be justice? (334c). (iv) It does not seem to be just to treat anyone badly, not even an enemy (335b).  Discussion between Socrates and Thrasymachus follows (336b-354c).

Thrasymachus defines justice as the advantage or what is beneficial to the stronger (338c).  Justice is different under different political regimes according to the laws, which are made to serve the interests of the strong (the ruling class in each regime, 338e-339a).  Socrates requires clarification of the definition: does it mean that justice is what the stronger think is beneficial to them or what is actually beneficial to them (339b)?  And don’t the strong rulers make mistakes and sometimes create laws that do not serve their advantage (339c)?  Thrasymachus points out that the stronger are really only those who do not make mistakes as to what is to their advantage (340d).  Socrates responds with a discussion of art or craft and points out that its aim is to do what is good for its subjects, not what is good for the practitioner (341c).  Thrasymachus suggests that some arts, such as that of shepherds, do not do this but rather aim at the advantage of the practitioner (343c). He also adds the claim that injustice is in every way better than justice and that the unjust person who commits injustice undetected is always happier than the just person (343e-344c).  The paradigm of the happy unjust person is the tyrant who is able to satisfy all his desires (344a-b).  Socrates points out that the shepherd’s concern for his sheep is different from his concern to make money, which is extraneous to the art (345c) and that no power or art provides what is beneficial to itself (346e).  Socrates claims that the best rulers are reluctant to rule but do so out of necessity: they do not wish to be ruled by someone inferior (347a-c).

Socrates offers three argument in favor of the just life over the unjust life: (i) the just man is wise and good, and the unjust man is ignorant and bad (349b); (ii) injustice produces internal disharmony which prevents effective actions (351b); (iii) virtue is excellence at a thing’s function and the just person lives a happier life than the unjust person, since he performs the various functions of the human soul well (352d).  Socrates is dissatisfied with the discussion since an adequate account of justice is necessary before they can address whether the just life is better than the unjust life (354b).

b. Book II

Glaucon is not persuaded by the arguments in the previous discussion (357a).  He divides good things into three classes: things good in themselves, things good both in themselves and for their consequences, and things good only for their consequences (357b-d).  Socrates places justice in the class of things good in themselves and for their consequences.

Glaucon renews Thrasymachus’ argument to challenge Socrates to defend justice by itself without any consideration of what comes from it (358b ff.).  Glaucon gives a speech defending injustice: (i) justice originates as a compromise between weak people who are afraid that suffering injustice is worse than doing it (358e-359a);  (ii) people act justly because this is necessary and unavoidable, so justice is good only for its consequences (story of the ring of Gyges’ ancestor, 359c-360d); (iii) the unjust person with the reputation for justice is happier than the just person with the reputation for injustice (360d-362c).

Adeimantus expands Glaucon’s defense of injustice and attack on justice by asserting: the reputation of justice is better than justice itself, so the unjust person who is able to keep the reputation of being just will be happier than the just person; discussion of various ways that the unjust can acquire the reputation for justice (362d-366d).

Socrates is asked to defend justice for itself, not for the reputation it allows for (367b).  He proposes to look for justice in the city first and then to proceed by analogy to find justice in the individual (368c-369a).  This approach will allow for a clearer judgment on the question of whether the just person is happier than the unjust person.  Socrates begins by discussing the origins of political life and constructs a just city in speech that satisfies only basic human necessities (369b-372c).  Socrates argues that humans enter political life since each is not self-sufficient by nature.  Each human has certain natural abilities (370a) and doing only the single job one is naturally suited for, is the most efficient way to satisfy the needs of all the citizens (370c).  Glaucon objects that Socrates’ city is too simple and calls it “a city of pigs” (372d).  Socrates describes a city that allows for luxuries (“a feverish city,” 372e-373e).  Socrates points out that the luxurious city will require an army to guard the city (373e).  The army will be composed of professional soldiers, the guardians, who, like dogs, must be gentle to fellow citizens and harsh to enemies (375c).  The guardians need to be educated very carefully to be able to do their job of protecting the city’s citizens, laws, and customs well (376d).  Poetry and stories need to be censored to guarantee such an education (377b).  Poetry should: (i) present the gods as good and only as causes of good (379a); (ii) as unchanging in form (380d); (iii) as beings who refrain from lies and deception (381e).

c. Book III

Socrates continues the political measures of the censorship of poetry: (iv) the underworld should not be portrayed as a bad place so that the guardians will not be too afraid of death (386b); (v) the heroes and gods should not be presented lamenting so that the guardians can develop courage (387e); (vi) poetry should prevent people from laughing violently (388e); (vii) poetry should promote the guardian’s sense of truth-telling but with the willingness to lie when this is conducive to the good of the city (389b); (viii) it should promote self-discipline and obedience (389c-d); (ix) it should not include stories that contribute to avarice (390d); (x) it should not include stories that contribute to hubris or impiety (391a).  Socrates moves on to discuss the manner in which stories should be told (392d).  He divides such manners into simple narration (in third person) and imitative narration (in first person, 392d).  To keep the guardians doing only their job, Socrates argues that the guardians may imitate only what is appropriate for this (394e-395d).  The just city should allow only modes and rhythms that fit the content of poetry allowed in the just city (398b-399c).  Socrates explains how good art can lead to the formation of good character and make people more likely to follow their reason (400e-402c).  Socrates turns to the physical education of the guardians and says that it should include physical training that prepares them for war, a careful diet, and habits that contribute to the avoidance of doctors (403c-405b).  Physical education should be geared to benefit the soul rather than the body, since the body necessarily benefits when the soul is in a good condition, whereas the soul does not necessarily benefit when the body is in a good condition (410b-c).

Socrates begins to describe how the rulers of the just city are to be selected from the class of the guardians: they need to be older, strong, wise, and wholly unwilling to do anything other than what is advantageous to the city (412b-414b).  Socrates suggests that they need to tell the citizens a myth that should be believed by subsequent generations in order for everyone to accept his position in the city (414b-415d).  The myth of metals portrays each human as having a precious metal in them: those naturally suited to be rulers have gold, those suited to be guardians have silver, and those suited for farming and the other crafts have bronze.

Socrates proceeds to discuss the living and housing conditions of the guardians: they will not have private property, they will have little privacy, they will receive what they need from the city via taxation of the other classes, and they will live communally and have common messes (415e-416e).

d. Book IV

Adeimantus complains that the guardians in the just city will not be very happy (419a).  Socrates points out that the aim is to make the whole city, and not any particular class, as happy as possible (420b).  Socrates discusses several other measures for the city as a whole in order to accomplish this.  There should be neither too much wealth nor too much poverty in the city since these cause social strife (421d-422a).  The just city should be only as large in size as would permit it to be unified and stable (423b).  Socrates reemphasizes the importance of the guardian’s education and suggests that the guardians will possess wives and children in common (423e). He suggests that they should only allow very limited ways by which innovations may be introduced to education or change in the laws (424b-425e).  The just city will follow traditional Greek religious customs (427b).

With the founding of the just city completed, Socrates proceeds to discuss justice (427d).  He claims that the city they have founded is completely good and virtuous and thus it is wise, courageous, moderate, and just (427e).  Justice will be what remains once they find the other three virtues in it, namely wisdom, courage, and moderation (428a).  The wisdom of the just city is found in its rulers and it is the type of knowledge that allows them to rule the city well (428b-d).  The courage of the just city is found in its military and it is correct and lawful belief about what to fear and what not to fear (429a-430b).  The city’s moderation or self-discipline is its unanimity in following the just city’s structure in terms of who should rule and who should be ruled (430d-432a).  The city’s justice consists in each class performing its proper function (433a-b).

Socrates then proceeds to find the corresponding four virtues in the individual (434d).  Socrates defends the analogy of the city and the individual (435a-b) and proceeds to distinguish three analogous parts in the soul with their natural functions (436b).  By using instances of psychological conflict, he distinguishes the function of the rational part from that of the appetitive part of the soul (439a).  Then he distinguishes the function of the spirited part from the functions of the two other parts (439e-440e).  The function of the rational part is thinking, that of the spirited part the experience of emotions, and that of the appetitive part the pursuit of bodily desires.  Socrates explains the virtues of the individual’s soul and how they correspond to the virtues of the city (441c-442d).  Socrates points out that one is just when each of the three parts of the soul performs its function (442d).  Justice is a natural balance of the soul’s parts and injustice is an imbalance of the parts of the soul (444e).  Socrates is now ready to answer the question of whether justice is more profitable than injustice that goes unpunished (444e-445a).  To do so he will need to examine the various unjust political regimes and the corresponding unjust individuals in each (445c-e).

e. Book V

Socrates is about to embark on a discussion of the unjust political regimes and the corresponding unjust individuals when he is interrupted by Adeimantus and Polemarchus (449a-b).  They insist that he needs to address the comment he made earlier that the guardians will possess the women and the children of the city in common (449b-d).  Socrates reluctantly agrees (450a-451b) and begins with the suggestion that the guardian women should perform the same job as the male guardians (451c-d).  Some may follow convention and object that women should be given different jobs because they differ from men by nature (453a-c). Socrates responds by indicating that the natural differences between men and women are not relevant when it comes to the jobs of protecting and ruling the city.  Both sexes are naturally suited for these tasks (454d-e).  Socrates goes on to argue that the measure of allowing the women to perform the same tasks as the men in this way is not only feasible but also best.  This is the case since the most suited people for the job will be performing it (456c).

Socrates also proposes that there should be no separate families among the members of the guardian class: the guardians will possess all the women and children in common (457c-d).  Socrates proceeds to discuss how this measure is for the best and Glaucon allows him to skip discussing its feasibility (458a-c).  The best guardian men are to have sex with the best guardian women to produce offspring of a similar nature (458d-459d).    Socrates describes the system of eugenics in more detail.  In order to guarantee that the best guardian men have sex with the best guardian women, the city will have marriage festivals supported by a rigged lottery system (459e-460a).  The best guardian men will also be allowed to have sex with as many women as they desire in order to increase the likelihood of giving birth to children with similar natures (460a-b).  Once born, the children will be taken away to a rearing pen to be taken care of by nurses and the parents will not be allowed to know who their own children are (460c-d).  This is so that the parents think of all the children as their own.  Socrates recognizes that this system will result in members of the same family having intercourse with each other (461c-e).

Socrates proceeds to argue that these arrangements will ensure that unity spreads throughout the city (462a-465d).  Responding to Adeimantus’ earlier complaint that the guardians would not be happy, Socrates indicates that the guardians will be happy with their way of life; they will have their needs satisfied and will receive sufficient honor from the city (465d-e).  Thereafter, Socrates discusses how the guardians will conduct war (466e).

Glaucon interrupts him and demands an account explaining how such a just city can come into being (471c-e).  Socrates admits that this is the most difficult criticism to address (472a). Then he explains that the theoretical model of the just city they constructed remains valid for discussing justice and injustice even if they cannot prove that such a city can come to exist (472b-473b).  Socrates claims that the model of the just city cannot come into being until philosophers rule as kings or kings become philosophers (473c-d).  He also points out that this is the only possible route by which to reach complete happiness in both public and private life (473e).  Socrates indicates that they to, discuss philosophy and philosophers to justify these claims (474b-c).  Philosophers love and pursue all of wisdom (475b-c) and they especially love the sight of truth (475e).  Philosophers are the only ones who recognize and find pleasure in what is behind the multiplicity of appearances, namely the single Form (476a-b).  Socrates distinguishes between those who know the single Forms that are and those who have opinions (476d).  Those who have opinions do not know, since opinions have becoming and changing appearances as their object, whereas knowledge implies that the objects thereof are stable (476e-477e).

f. Book VI

Socrates goes on to explain why philosophers should rule the city.  They should do so since they are better able to know the truth and since they have the relevant practical knowledge by which to rule.  The philosopher’s natural abilities and virtues prove that they have what is necessary to rule well: they love what is rather than what becomes (485a-b), they hate falsehood (485c), they are moderate (485d-e), they are courageous (486a-b), they are quick learners (486c), they have a good memory (486c-d), they like proportion since the truth is like it, and they have a pleasant nature (486d-487a).

Adeimantus objects that actual philosophers are either useless or bad people (487a-d).  Socrates responds with the analogy of the ship of state to show that philosophers are falsely blamed for their uselessness (487e-489a).  Like a doctor who does not beg patients to heal them, the philosopher should not plead with people to rule them (489b-c).  To the accusation that philosophers are bad, Socrates responds that those with the philosopher’s natural abilities and with outstanding natures often get corrupted by a bad education and become outstandingly bad (491b-e).  Thus, someone can only be a philosopher in the true sense if he receives the proper kind of education.  After a discussion of the sophists as bad teachers (492a-493c), Socrates warns against various people who falsely claim to be philosophers (495b-c).  Since current political regimes lead to either the corruption or the destruction of the philosopher, he should avoid politics and lead a quiet private life (496c-d).

Socrates then addresses the question of how philosophy can come to play an important role in existing cities (497e).  Those with philosophical natures need to practice philosophy all their lives, especially when they are older (498a-c).  The only way to make sure that philosophy is properly appreciated and does not meet hostility is to wipe an existing city clean and begin it anew (501a).  Socrates concludes that the just city and the measures proposed are both for the best and not impossible to bring about (502c).

Socrates proceeds to discuss the education of philosopher kings (502c-d).  The most important thing philosophers should study is the Form of the Good (505a).  Socrates considers several candidates for what the Good is, such as pleasure and knowledge and he rejects them (505b-d).  He points out that we choose everything with a view to the good (505e).  Socrates attempts to explain what the Form of the Good is through the analogy of the sun (507c-509d).  As the sun illuminates objects so the eye can see them, the Form of the Good renders the objects of knowledge knowable to the human soul.  As the sun provides things with their ability to be, to grow, and with nourishment, the Form of the Good provides the objects of knowledge with their being even though it itself is higher than being (509b).

Socrates offers the analogy of the divided line to explain the Form of the Good even further (509d-511d).  He divides a line into two unequal sections once and then into two unequal sections again.  The lowest two parts represent the visible realm and the top two parts the intelligible realm.  In the first of the four sections of the line, Socrates places images/shadows, in the second section visible objects, in the third section truths arrived at via hypotheses as mathematicians do, and in the last section the Forms themselves.  Corresponding to each of these, there is a capacity of the human soul: imagination, belief, thought, and understanding.  The line also represents degrees of clarity and opacity as the lowest sections are more opaque and the higher sections clearer.

g. Book VII

Socrates continues his discussion of the philosopher and the Forms with a third analogy, the analogy of the cave (514a-517c).  This represents the philosopher’s education from ignorance to knowledge of the Forms.  True education is the turning around of the soul from shadows and visible objects to true understanding of the Forms (518c-d).  Philosophers who accomplish this understanding will be reluctant to do anything other than contemplate the Forms but they must be forced to return to the cave (the city) and rule it.

Socrates proceeds to outline the structure of the philosopher king’s education so that they can reach an understanding of the Forms (521d).  Those who eventually become philosopher kings will initially be educated like the other guardians in poetry, music, and physical education (521d-e).  Then they will receive education in mathematics: arithmetic and number (522c), plane geometry (526c), and solid geometry (528b).  Following these, they will study astronomy (528e), and harmonics (530d).  Then they will study dialectic which will lead them to understand the Forms and the Form of the Good (532a).  Socrates gives a partial explanation of the nature of dialectic and leaves Glaucon with no clear explanation of its nature or how it may lead to understanding (532a-535a).  Then they discuss who will receive this course of education and how long they are to study these subjects (535a-540b).  The ones receiving this type of education need to exhibit the natural abilities suited to a philosopher discussed earlier.  After the training in dialectic the education system will include fifteen years of practical political training (539e-540c) to prepare philosopher kings for ruling the city.  Socrates concludes by suggesting that the easiest way to bring the just city into being would be to expel everyone over the age of ten out of an existing city (540e-541b).

h. Book VIII

Socrates picks up the argument that was interrupted in Book V.  Glaucon remembers that Socrates was about to describe the four types of unjust regime along with their corresponding unjust individuals (543c-544b).  Socrates announces that he will begin discussing the regimes and individual that deviate the least from the just city and individual and proceed to discuss the ones that deviate the most (545b-c).  The cause of change in regime is lack of unity in the rulers (545d).  Assuming that the just city could come into being, Socrates indicates that it would eventually change since everything which comes into being must decay (546a-b).  The rulers are bound to make mistakes in assigning people jobs suited to their natural capacities and each of the classes will begin to be mixed with people who are not naturally suited for the tasks relevant to each class (546e).  This will lead to class conflicts (547a).

The first deviant regime from just kingship or aristocracy will be timocracy, that emphasizes the pursuit of honor rather than wisdom and justice (547d ff.).  The timocratic individual will have a strong spirited part in his soul and will pursue honor, power, and success (549a).  This city will be militaristic.  Socrates explains the process by which an individual becomes timocratic: he listens to his mother complain about his father’s lack of interest in honor and success (549d).  The timocratic individual’s soul is at a middle point between reason and spirit.

Oligarchy arises out of timocracy and it emphasizes wealth rather than honor (550c-e).  Socrates discusses how it arises out of timocracy and its characteristics (551c-552e): people will pursue wealth; it will essentially be two cities, a city of wealthy citizens and a city of poor people; the few wealthy will fear the many poor; people will do various jobs simultaneously; the city will allow for poor people without means; it will have a high crime rate.  The oligarchic individual comes by seeing his father lose his possessions and feeling insecure he begins to greedily pursue wealth (553a-c).  Thus he allows his appetitive part to become a more dominant part of his soul (553c).  The oligarchic individual’s soul is at middle point between the spirited and the appetitive part.

Socrates proceeds penultimately, to discuss democracy.  It comes about when the rich become too rich and the poor too poor (555c-d).  Too much luxury makes the oligarchs soft and the poor revolt against them (556c-e).  In democracy most of the political offices are distributed by lot (557a).  The primary goal of the democratic regime is freedom or license (557b-c).  People will come to hold offices without having the necessary knowledge (557e) and everyone is treated as an equal in ability (equals and unequals alike, 558c). The democratic individual comes to pursue all sorts of bodily desires excessively (558d-559d) and allows his appetitive part to rule his soul.  He comes about when his bad education allows him to transition from desiring money to desiring bodily and material goods (559d-e).  The democratic individual has no shame and no self-discipline (560d).

Tyranny arises out of democracy when the desire for freedom to do what one wants becomes extreme (562b-c).  The freedom or license aimed at in the democracy becomes so extreme that any limitations on anyone’s freedom seem unfair.  Socrates points out that when freedom is taken to such an extreme it produces its opposite, slavery (563e-564a).  The tyrant comes about by presenting himself as a champion of the people against the class of the few people who are wealthy (565d-566a).  The tyrant is forced to commit a number of acts to gain and retain power: accuse people falsely, attack his kinsmen, bring people to trial under false pretenses, kill many people, exile many people, and purport to cancel the debts of the poor to gain their support (565e-566a).  The tyrant eliminates the rich, brave, and wise people in the city since he perceives them as threats to his power (567c).  Socrates indicates that the tyrant faces the dilemma to either live with worthless people or with good people who may eventually depose him and chooses to live with worthless people (567d).  The tyrant ends up using mercenaries as his guards since he cannot trust any of the citizens (567d-e).  The tyrant also needs a very large army and will spend the city’s money (568d-e), and will not hesitate to kill members of his own family if they resist his ways (569b-c).

i. Book IX

Socrates is now ready to discuss the tyrannical individual (571a).  He begins by discussing necessary and unnecessary pleasures and desires (571b-c).  Those with balanced souls ruled by reason are able to keep their unnecessary desires from becoming lawless and extreme (571d-572b).  The tyrannical individual comes out of the democratic individual when the latter’s unnecessary desires and pleasures become extreme; when he becomes full of Eros or lust (572c-573b).  The tyrannical person is mad with lust (573c) and this leads him to seek any means by which to satisfy his desires and to resist anyone who gets in his way (573d-574d).  Some tyrannical individuals eventually become actual tyrants (575b-d).  Tyrants associate themselves with flatterers and are incapable of friendship (575e-576a).  Applying the analogy of the city and the soul, Socrates proceeds to argue that the tyrannical individual is the most unhappy individual (576c ff.).  Like the tyrannical city, the tyrannical individual is enslaved (577c-d), least likely to do what he wants (577d-e), poor and unsatisfiable (579e-578a), fearful and full of wailing and lamenting (578a).  The individual who becomes an actual tyrant of a city is the unhappiest of all (578b-580a).  Socrates concludes this first argument with a ranking of the individuals in terms of happiness: the more just one is the happier (580b-c).

He proceeds to a second proof that the just are happier than the unjust (580d).  Socrates distinguishes three types of persons: one who pursues wisdom, another who pursues honor, and another who pursues profit (579d-581c).  He argues that we should trust the wisdom lover’s judgment in his way of life as the most pleasant, since he is able to consider all three types of life clearly (581c-583a).

Socrates proceeds to offer a third proof that the just are happier than the unjust (583b).  He begins with an analysis of pleasure: relief from pain may seem pleasant (583c) and bodily pleasures are merely a relief from pain but not true pleasure (584b-c).  The only truly fulfilling pleasure is that which comes from understanding since the objects it pursues are permanent (585b-c).  Socrates adds that only if the rational part rules the soul, will each part of the soul find its proper pleasure (586d-587a).  He concludes the argument with a calculation of how many times the best life is more pleasant than the worst: seven-hundred and twenty nine (587a-587e).  Socrates discusses an imaginary multi-headed beast to illustrate the consequences of justice and injustice in the soul and to support justice (588c ff.).

j. Book X

Thereafter, Socrates returns to the subject of poetry and claims that the measures introduced to exclude imitative poetry from the just city seem clearly justified now (595a).  Poetry is to be censored since the poets may not know which is; thus may lead the soul astray (595b).  Socrates proceeds to discuss imitation.  He explains what it is by distinguishing several levels of imitation through the example of a couch: there is the Form of the couch, the particular couch, and a painting of a couch (596a-598b).  The products of imitation are far removed from the truth (597e-598c).  Poets, like painters are imitators who produce imitations without knowledge of the truth (598e-599a).  Socrates argues that if poets had knowledge of the truth they would want to be people who do great things rather than remain poets (599b).  Socrates doubts the poet’s capacity to teach virtue since he only imitates images of it (599c-601a).  The poet’s knowledge is inferior to that of the maker of other products and the maker’s knowledge is inferior to that of the user’s (601c-602b).

Now Socrates considers how imitators affect their audiences (602c).  He uses a comparison with optical illusions (602c) to argue that imitative poetry causes the parts of the soul to be at war with each other and this leads to injustice (603c-605b).  The most serious charge against imitative poetry is that it even corrupts decent people (605c).  He concludes that the just city should not allow such poetry in it but only poetry that praises the gods and good humans (606e-607a).  Imitative poetry prevents the immortal soul from attaining its greatest reward (608c-d).

Glaucon wonders if the soul is immortal and Socrates launches into an argument proving its immortality: things that are destroyed, are destroyed by their own evil; the body’s evil is disease and this can destroy it; the soul’s evils are ignorance, injustice and the other vices but these do not destroy the soul; thus, the soul is immortal (608d-611a).  Socrates points out that we cannot understand the nature of the soul if we only consider its relation to the body as the present discussion has (611b-d).

Socrates finally describes the rewards of justice by first having Glaucon allow that he can discuss the rewards of reputation for justice (612b-d).  Glaucon allows this since Socrates has already defended justice by itself in the soul.  Socrates indicates justice and injustice do not escape the notice of the gods, that the gods love the just and hate the unjust, and that good things come to those whom the gods love (612e-613a).  Socrates lists various rewards for the just and punishments for the unjust in this life (613a-e).  He proceeds to tell the Myth of Er that is supposed to illustrate reward and punishment in the afterlife (614b).  The souls of the dead go up through an opening on the right if they were just, or below through an opening on the left if they were unjust (614d).  The various souls discuss their rewards and punishments (614e-615a).  Socrates explains the multiples by which people are punished and rewarded (615a-b).  The souls of the dead are able to choose their next lives (617d) and then they are reincarnated (620e).  Socrates ends the discussion by prompting Glaucon and the others to do well both in this life and in the afterlife (621c-d).

2. Ethics or Political Philosophy?

The Republic has acquired the recognition of a classic and seminal work in political philosophy.  It is often taught in courses that focus on political theory or political philosophy.  Moreover, in the dialogue Socrates seems primarily concerned with what is an ethical issue, namely whether the just life is better than the unjust life for the individual.  These two observations raise two issues.  The first is whether the Republic is primarily about ethics or about politics.  If it is primarily about ethics then perhaps its recognition as a seminal political work is unwarranted.  Moreover, considering it a political work would be somewhat mistaken.  The second issue is that even if thinking of it as a classic in political philosophy is warranted, it is very difficult to situate it in terms of its political position.

Interpreters of the Republic have presented various arguments concerning the issue of whether the dialogue is primarily about ethics or about politics.  As is evident from Books I and II, Socrates’ main aim in the dialogue is to prove that the just person is better off than the unjust person.  In Book II, he proposes to construct the just city in speech in order to find justice in it and then to proceed to find justice in the individual (368a). Thus, he seems to use a discussion in political matters as a means by which to answer what is essentially an ethical question.  But, Socrates also spends a lot of time in the dialogue on political matters in relation to the question of political justice such as education, the positions and relations among political classes, war, property, the causes of political strife and change of regimes, and several other matters.  Each of these could provide important contributions to political philosophy.

One argument, suggesting that the dialogue is primarily concerned with the ethical question, focuses on Socrates’ presentation of the political discussion of justice as instrumental to discovering justice in the individual.  Another relevant consideration is that there are several indications in the dialogue that the aim in the discussion is more pressing than the means (the just city).  Thus, the argument goes, Socrates does not seem primarily interested in discussing political philosophy but ethics instead. Another related argument indicates that the discussion entails great doubts about whether the just city is even possible. Socrates claims this along with the idea that the function of the just city in the argument is to enable the individual to get a better idea of justice and injustice (472b-d, 592a-b).  Thus, it is very difficult for us to conclude that Socrates takes the political discussion as seriously as he does the moral question (see Annas, Julia.  Platonic Ethics, Old and New).

Other interpreters indicate that the Republic is essentially about both ethics and politics (among others see Santas, Gerasimos. Understanding Plato’s Republic; Schofield, Malcolm. Plato: Political Philosophy; Reeve C.D.C. Philosopher Kings). Some emphasize that many of Socrates’ proposals for social reform (education, property, the role of women, the family) go beyond what is needed to be able to argue that the just person is better off than the unjust person.  Thus, these social reforms seem to be developed for their own sake.

Some indicate that Socrates’ discussion of political matters is meant, in part, to provide us with Plato’s critique of Greek political life.  In Book VIII he criticizes democracy as an unjust regime and thus he seems to launch a critique against Athenian democracy.  He also adopts several measures in the just city, which were part of the Spartan constitution.  Like Spartan citizens, the guardians of the just city are professional soldiers whose aim is the protection of the city, the guardians eat together, and they have their needs provided for by other classes.  But unlike Sparta, the just city has philosophers as rulers, a rigorous system of education in intellectual matters, and it is not timocratic or honor loving.  These differences may be construed as a critique of Sparta’s political life.  Thus, the argument suggests, in addition to the main ethical question the dialogue is also about political philosophy.

Another position is that even though the discussion of political matters is instrumental to addressing the main ethical question of the dialogue, Socrates makes several important contributions to political philosophy.  One such contribution is his description of political regimes in Book VIII and his classification of them on a scale of more or less just.  Another such contribution is his consideration of the causes of political change from one political regime to another.  Moreover, Socrates seems to raise and address a number of questions that seem necessary in order to understand political life clearly.  He raises the issues of the role of women in the city, the role of the family, the role of art, the issue of class relations, of political stability, of the limitation of people’s freedoms and several others.  Thus, according to this view, it is warranted to regard the Republic as a work on political philosophy and as a seminal work in that area.

A further relevant consideration has to do with how one understands the nature of ethics and political philosophy and their relation.  Since modernity, it becomes much easier to treat these as separate subjects.  Modern ethics is more focused on determining whether an action is morally permissible or not whereas ancient ethics is more focused on happiness or the good life.  Many ancient thinkers want to address the question “what is the happy life?” and in order to do this they think that it is warranted to address political matters.  Humans live their lives in political communities and the kind of political community they live in can be conducive or detrimental to one’s happiness.  Thus, ethics and political philosophy are more closely linked for ancient thinkers than they may be for us since modernity.  Ethics and political philosophy seem to be different sides of the same coin.

The second issue has to do with situating the Republic’s political stance.  There are several competing candidates.  The Republic entails elements of socialism as when Socrates expresses the desire to achieve happiness for the whole city not for any particular group of it (420b) and when he argues against inequalities in wealth (421d).  There are also elements of fascism or totalitarianism. Among others, there is extreme censorship of poetry, lying to maintain good behavior and political stability, restriction of power to a small elite group, eugenic techniques, centralized control of the citizen’s lives, a strong military group that enforces the laws, and suppression of freedom of expression and choice.  Several commentators focused on these elements to dismiss the Republic as a proto-totalitarian text (see Popper, Karl.  The Open Society and Its Enemies). There are also some strong elements of communism such as the idea that the guardian class ought to possess things in common.  Despite, Socrates’ emphasis on the individual and the condition of his soul, the Republic does not entail the kernels of what becomes modern liberalism. Socrates seems to argue against allowing much freedom to individuals and to criticize the democratic tendency to treat humans as equals. Some have argued that the Republic is neither a precursor of these political positions nor does it fit any of them.  They find that the Republic has been such a seminal work in the history of political philosophy precisely because it raises such issues as its political stance while discussing many of the features of such political positions.

3. The Analogy of the City and the Soul

The analogy of the city and the soul, is Socrates proposed and accepted method by which to argue that the just person is better off than the unjust person (Book II, 368c-369a).  If Socrates is able to show how a just city is always happier than unjust cities, then he can have a model by which to argue that a just person is always happier than an unjust one.  He plausibly assumes that there is an interesting, intelligible, and non-accidental relation between the structural features and values of a city and an individual.  But commentators have found this curious approach one of the most puzzling features of the Republic.  The city/soul analogy is quite puzzling since Socrates seems to apply it in different ways, thus there is much controversy about the exact extent of the analogy.  Moreover, there is much controversy concerning its usefulness in the attempt to discover and to defend justice in terms of the individual.

In several passages Socrates seems to say that the same account of justice must apply to both cities (justice is the right order of classes) and to individuals (justice is the right order of the soul).  But even though he says this he seems to think that this ought to be the case for different reasons.  For example, at (435a), he seems to say that the same account of justice ought to apply to the city and to the individual since the same account of any predicate X must apply to all things that are X.  So, if a city or an individual is just then the same predicates must apply to both.  In other passages Socrates seems to mean that same account of justice ought to apply to the city and to the individual since the X-ness of the whole is due to the X-ness of the parts (435d).  So, if the people in the city are just, then this will cause the city to be just as well.  Yet still in other passages he seems to say that if a city is just and this causes it to have certain features such as wisdom or courage, then we can deduce that the individual’s being just will also cause him to be wise and courageous.  So if a city’s X-ness entails certain predicates, then the individual’s X-ness must entail the same predicates.  In other passages still, he seems to claim that the justice of the city can be used as a heuristic device by which to look for justice in the individual, thus the relation between the two seems quite loose (368e-369a).  (For a thorough discussion of these issues and the various interpretations of the city/soul analogy see Ferrari, G.R.F. City and Soul in Plato’s Republic.)

4. Plato’s Defense of Justice

In response to Thrasymachus, Glaucon, and Adeimantus, Socrates seeks to show that it is always in an individual’s interest to be just, rather than unjust.  Thus, one of the most pressing issues regarding the Republic is whether Socrates defends justice successfully or not.  David Sachs, in his influential article “A Fallacy in Plato’s Republic”, argues that Socrates’ defense of justice entails a crucial problem which renders the defense problematic.  Sachs argues that Socrates commits the fallacy of irrelevance.  Socrates sets out to defend the idea that it is always in one’s interest to be just and to act justly and he presents the just person as one who has a balanced soul.  Sachs observes that what Socrates defends is psychic health or rationality which may lead one to be happy but he fails to defend justice.  Socrates fails to show why having a balanced soul will lead one to act justly or why psychic health amounts to justice.  Sachs implies that justice, as this is traditionally understood, includes actions in relation to others, it includes considerations of other people’s good, and also includes strong motivations not to act unjustly.  According to Sachs, Socrates’ defense of justice does not include compelling reasons to think that a person with a balanced soul will refrain from acts that are traditionally thought to be unjust such as say, theft, murder, or adultery.  Thus, Plato presents Socrates defending psychic health rather than justice.

Sachs’ critique indicates that as Socrates presents the just person, the person’s balanced soul does not entail a sufficient causal or logical connection to performing socially just actions.  In order to save Socrates’ defense of justice one needs to show that there is a logical and a causal connection between having a balanced soul and performing socially just actions.  Otherwise, the problem of being psychically just but socially unjust remains

Given Sachs’ critique, several commentators have come to Socrates’ defense to bridge the gap between a just soul and just actions (these are discussed in detail by Singpurwalla, Rachel G. K. “Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic”).  One approach to bridging the gap between a just soul and just actions has been to show that the just person with a balanced soul operates according to certain values and desires which cannot lead to unjust actions (see Kraut, Richard “The Defense of Justice in Plato’s Republic”).  The just person’s soul entails desires for certain kinds of objects the most important of which is knowledge.  Socrates indicates the difficulty and extreme effort required to attain knowledge of the forms and the form of the Good, thus the just person will pursue learning and not spend time indulging in the satisfaction of desires that typically lead to unjust actions.  This approach of bridging the gap between a just soul and just actions may have some drawbacks.  One drawback may be that several unjust actions may be motivated by desires that are compatible with the desire for knowledge.  For example, why wouldn’t a person with a great desire for knowledge steal a book if this would contribute to his knowledge.

A second approach to bridging the gap between the just soul and just actions has been to show that the just person’s knowledge of the good, directly motivates him to perform just actions and to refrain from unjust ones (see Cooper, John “The Psychology of Justice in Plato’s Republic” and White, N. A Companion to Plato’s Republic).  A crucial piece of evidence for this approach is Socrates’ presentation of the philosopher who agrees to rule the city even though this will interfere with his desire to learn.  The proponents of this approach argue that the philosopher agrees to rule since his knowledge of the good directly motivates him to act against his interests and to do something that is good objectively and for others.  This approach has met at least one serious objection: the just person’s knowledge of the good may motivate him to do what is good for others but Socrates seeks to also argue that it is always in one’s interest to be just, thus this approach may suggest that just actions may not always be in the just person’s interests (for a discussion of this see Singpurwalla).  This objection amounts to the claim that the second approach may show that the just person will do just actions but it does this by sacrificing Socrates’ claim that being just is always in one’s interest.

Given the problems of the first two approaches, a third one attempts to show that the just person will do what is just in relation to others while at the same time doing what is in the just person’s interests.  In other words, this approach seeks to show that the just person’s own good is realized in doing what is also good for others.  According to this approach, the just person has a value that motivates him to do what is just, in relation to others and this value is the just person’s love of the forms (see Dahl, Norman “Plato’s Defense of Justice”).  The just person’s love of the forms is the desire to contemplate and also imitate or instantiate these in the world.  Thus, the philosopher regards ruling as something in his interest despite the fact that it interferes with his pursuit of knowledge, since in ruling he will be imitating the forms.  Even though this approach seems to bridge the gap between the just person and just actions and the gap between just actions and such actions being in the just person’s interest (this was the problem with the second approach) a criticism remains. Singpurwalla points out that only very few people can acquire such knowledge of the forms so as to be just persons, thus for most people Socrates offers no good reason to be just.  This third approach may save Socrates’ defense of justice only for people capable of knowing the forms, but falls short of showing that everyone has a reason to be just.

Singpurwalla suggests a fourth approach which can defend Socrates contra Sachs and which will avoid the criticisms launched against the other approaches.  She aims to show that Socrates has a good reason to think that it is in everyone’s interest to act justly because doing so satisfies a deeply ingrained human need, namely, the need to be unified with others.  Singpurwalla attempts to make her case by showing the following: (1) that according to Socrates our happiness largely resides in being unified with others (she cites the tyrant’s unhappiness due to bad relations with others as evidence for this, 567a-580a); (2) that being unified with others entails considering their own good when we act (she cites Socrates’ claims that when people are unified they share in each other’s pleasures and successes and failures as evidence for this, 462b-e, 463e-464d); (3) thus, behaving unjustly, which involves disregarding another’s good, is incompatible with being unified with others and with our happiness.  Singpurwalla’s position tries to show that even though the average person may not be able to attain the knowledge of the form of the good, he can still be motivated to act justly since this is in his interest.  Thus, Socrates’ defense of justice may be compelling for the philosopher as well as the average person.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Standard Greek Text

  • Slings, S.R. (ed.), Platonis Rempublicam (Oxford: Oxford Classical Texts, 2003).

b. English Translations

  • Shorey, Paul. Plato. Republic (2 vols. Loeb, 137-1937). This translation includes an introduction and notes.
  • Bloom, Allan. The Republic of Plato. (New York: Basic Books, 1968).  This translation includes notes and an interpretative essay.
  • Ferrari, G.R.F. (ed.), Griffith, Tom (trans.). Plato. The Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000).  This translation includes an introduction.
  • Reeve, C.D.C. Plato. The Republic. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2004).

c. General Discussions of the Republic

(all attempt to provide a unified interpretation of the dialogue).

  • Murphy, N.R. The Interpretation of Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1951).
  • Cross, R.C. and Woozley, A.D. Plato’s Republic: A Philosophical Commentary (New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1964).
  • White, Nicholas P. A Companion to Plato’s Republic (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1979).
  • Annas, Julia. An Introduction to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1981).
  • Reeve, C.D.C. Philosopher Kings: The Argument of Plato’s Republic (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988).
  • Howland, Jacob. The Republic: The Odyssey of Philosophy (Philadelphia: Paul Dry Books, 2004).
  • Rosen, Stanley. Plato’s Republic: A Study (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2005).
  • Santas, Gerasimos. Understanding Plato’s Republic (Wiley-Blackwell, 2010).

d. Discussions on Plato’s Ethics and Political Philosophy

(all entail a systematic discussion of ethics and/or political philosophy in the Republic).

  • Irwin, T.H. Platos Ethics (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995).
  • Annas, Julia. Platonic Ethics Old and New (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999).
  • Monoson, Sara.  Plato’s Democratic Entanglements (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2000).
  • Bobonich, Christopher.  Plato’s Utopia Recast (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002).
  • Schofield, Malcolm. Plato: Political Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006).
  • Rowe, Christopher. “The Place of the Republic in Plato’s Political Thought” in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

e. Discussions on the City/Soul Analogy.

  • Williams, Bernard. “The Analogy of City and Soul in Plato’s Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.).  Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Lear, Jonathan. “Inside and Outside the Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.).  Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Ferrari, G.R.F. City and Soul in Plato’s Republic (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 2005).
  • Blossner, Norbert. “The City-Soul Analogy”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

f. Discussions of Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic

(in chronological order; these essays discuss how Socrates defends justice and examine how well he does in doing so).

  • Sachs, David. “A Fallacy in Plato’s Republic”, in The Philosophical Review 72 (1963): 141-58.
  • Dahl, Norman O. “Plato’s Defense of Justice”, in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. Vol. 51, No. 4 (Dec. 1991).
  • Kraut, Richard. “The Defense of Justice in Plato’s Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Singpurwalla, Rachel G.K. “Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic”, in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).

g. Discussions of Political Measures Introduced in the Just City

i. Discussions of the Role of Women in the Just City

  • Discussions of the Role of Women in the Just City
  • Vlastos, Gregory.  “Was Plato a Feminist?”, Times Literary Supplement, No. 4, 485, Mar. 17, 1989, 276, 288-89.
  • Saxonhouse, Arlene. “The philosopher and the Female in the Political Thought of Plato”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Reeve. C.D.C. “The Naked Old Women in the Palaestra”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).

ii. Discussions of Poetry in the Just City

  • Urmson, James O. “Plato and the Poets”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • O’Connor, David K. “Rewriting the Poets in Plato’s Characters”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
  • Moss, Jessica.  “What is Imitative Poetry and Why is it Bad?”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

iii. Discussions on the Soul in the Republic

  • Lorenz, Hendrik. “The Analysis of the Soul in Plato’s Republic” in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).
  • Ferrari, G.R.F., “The Three-Part Soul”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Cambridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

iv. Discussions on Plato’s Moral Psychology in the Republic

  • Cooper, John M. “The Psychology of Justice in Plato” in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
  • Anagnostopoulos, Mariana.  “The Divided Soul and the Desire for Good in Plato’s Republic” in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).


Author Information

Antonis Coumoundouros
Adrian College
U. S. A.

The Sophists (Ancient Greek)

The sophists were itinerant professional teachers and intellectuals who frequented Athens and other Greek cities in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. In return for a fee, the sophists offered young wealthy Greek men an education in aretē (virtue or excellence), thereby attaining wealth and fame while also arousing significant antipathy. Prior to the fifth century B.C.E., aretē was predominately associated with aristocratic warrior virtues such as courage and physical strength. In democratic Athens of the latter fifth century B.C.E., however, aretē was increasingly understood in terms of the ability to influence one’s fellow citizens in political gatherings through rhetorical persuasion; the sophistic education both grew out of and exploited this shift. The most famous representatives of the sophistic movement are Protagoras, Gorgias, Antiphon, Hippias, Prodicus and Thrasymachus.

The historical and philological difficulties confronting an interpretation of the sophists are significant. Only a handful of sophistic texts have survived and most of what we know of the sophists is drawn from second-hand testimony, fragments and the generally hostile depiction of them in Plato’s dialogues.

The philosophical problem of the nature of sophistry is arguably even more formidable. Due in large part to the influence of Plato and Aristotle, the term sophistry has come to signify the deliberate use of fallacious reasoning, intellectual charlatanism and moral unscrupulousness. It is, as the article explains, an oversimplification to think of the historical sophists in these terms because they made genuine and original contributions to Western thought. Plato and Aristotle nonetheless established their view of what constitutes legitimate philosophy in part by distinguishing their own activity – and that of Socrates – from the sophists. If one is so inclined, sophistry can thus be regarded, in a conceptual as well as historical sense, as the ‘other’ of philosophy.

Perhaps because of the interpretative difficulties mentioned above, the sophists have been many things to many people. For Hegel (1995/1840) the sophists were subjectivists whose sceptical reaction to the objective dogmatism of the presocratics was synthesised in the work of Plato and Aristotle. For the utilitarian English classicist George Grote (1904), the sophists were progressive thinkers who placed in question the prevailing morality of their time. More recent work by French theorists such as Jacques Derrida (1981) and Jean Francois-Lyotard (1985) suggests affinities between the sophists and postmodernism.

This article provides a broad overview of the sophists, and indicates some of the central philosophical issues raised by their work. Section 1 discusses the meaning of the term sophist. Section 2 surveys the individual contributions of the most famous sophists. Section 3 examines three themes that have often been taken as characteristic of sophistic thought: the distinction between nature and convention, relativism about knowledge and truth and the power of speech. Finally, section 4 analyses attempts by Plato and others to establish a clear demarcation between philosophy and sophistry.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Sophists
    1. Protagoras
    2. Gorgias
    3. Antiphon
    4. Hippias
    5. Prodicus
    6. Thrasymachus
  3. Major Themes of Sophistic Thought
    1. Nature and Convention
    2. Relativism
    3. Language and Reality
  4. The Distinction Between Philosophy and Sophistry
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Other Reading

1. Introduction

The term sophist (sophistēs) derives from the Greek words for wisdom (sophia) and wise (sophos). Since Homer at least, these terms had a wide range of application, extending from practical know-how and prudence in public affairs to poetic ability and theoretical knowledge. Notably, the term sophia could be used to describe disingenuous cleverness long before the rise of the sophistic movement. Theognis, for example, writing in the sixth century B.C.E., counsels Cyrnos to accommodate his discourse to different companions, because such cleverness (sophiē) is superior to even a great excellence (Elegiac Poems, 1072, 213).

In the fifth century B.C.E. the term sophistēs was still broadly applied to ‘wise men’, including poets such as Homer and Hesiod, the Seven Sages, the Ionian ‘physicists’ and a variety of seers and prophets. The narrower use of the term to refer to professional teachers of virtue or excellence (aretē) became prevalent in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E., although this should not be taken to imply the presence of a clear distinction between philosophers, such as Socrates, and sophists, such as Protagoras, Gorgias and Prodicus. This much is evident from Aristophanes’ play The Clouds (423 B.C.E.), in which Socrates is depicted as a sophist and Prodicus praised for his wisdom.

Aristophanes’ play is a good starting point for understanding Athenian attitudes towards sophists. The Clouds depicts the tribulations of Strepsiades, an elderly Athenian citizen with significant debts. Deciding that the best way to discharge his debts is to defeat his creditors in court, he attends The Thinkery, an institute of higher education headed up by the sophist Socrates. When he fails to learn the art of speaking in The Thinkery, Strepsiades persuades his initially reluctant son, Pheidippides, to accompany him. Here they encounter two associates of Socrates, the Stronger and the Weaker Arguments, who represent lives of justice and self-discipline and injustice and self-indulgence respectively. On the basis of a popular vote, the Weaker Argument prevails and leads Pheidippides into The Thinkery for an education in how to make the weaker argument defeat the stronger. Strepsiades later revisits The Thinkery and finds that Socrates has turned his son into a pale and useless intellectual. When Pheidippides graduates, he subsequently prevails not only over Strepsiades’ creditors, but also beats his father and offers a persuasive rhetorical justification for the act. As Pheidippides prepares to beat his mother, Strepsiades’ indignation motivates him to lead a violent mob attack on The Thinkery.

Aristophanes’ depiction of Socrates the sophist is revealing on at least three levels. In the first instance, it demonstrates that the distinction between Socrates and his sophistic counterparts was far from clear to their contemporaries. Although Socrates did not charge fees and frequently asserted that all he knew was that he was ignorant of most matters, his association with the sophists reflects both the indeterminacy of the term sophist and the difficulty, at least for the everyday Athenian citizen, of distinguishing his methods from theirs. Secondly, Aristophanes’ depiction suggests that the sophistic education reflected a decline from the heroic Athens of earlier generations. Thirdly, the attribution to the sophists of intellectual deviousness and moral dubiousness predates Plato and Aristotle.

Hostility towards sophists was a significant factor in the decision of the Athenian dēmos to condemn Socrates to the death penalty for impiety. Anytus, who was one of Socrates’ accusers at his trial, was clearly unconcerned with details such as that the man he accused did not claim to teach aretē or extract fees for so doing. He is depicted by Plato as suggesting that sophists are the ruin of all those who come into contact with them and as advocating their expulsion from the city (Meno, 91c-92c). Equally as revealing, in terms of attitudes towards the sophists, is Socrates’ discussion with Hippocrates, a wealthy young Athenian keen to become a pupil of Protagoras (Protagoras, 312a). Hippocrates is so eager to meet Protagoras that he wakes Socrates in the early hours of the morning, yet later concedes that he himself would be ashamed to be known as a sophist by his fellow citizens.

Plato depicts Protagoras as well aware of the hostility and resentment engendered by his profession (Protagoras, 316c-e). It is not surprising, Protagoras suggests, that foreigners who profess to be wise and persuade the wealthy youth of powerful cities to forsake their family and friends and consort with them would arouse suspicion. Indeed, Protagoras claims that the sophistic art is an ancient one, but that sophists of old, including poets such as Homer, Hesiod and Simonides, prophets, seers and even physical trainers, deliberately did not adopt the name for fear of persecution. Protagoras says that while he has adopted a strategy of openly professing to be a sophist, he has taken other precautions – perhaps including his association with the Athenian general Pericles – in order to secure his safety.

The low standing of the sophists in Athenian public opinion does not stem from a single source. No doubt suspicion of intellectuals among the many was a factor. New money and democratic decision-making, however, also constituted a threat to the conservative Athenian aristocratic establishment. This threatening social change is reflected in the attitudes towards the concept of excellence or virtue (aretē) alluded to in the summary above. Whereas in the Homeric epics aretē generally denotes the strength and courage of a real man, in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. it increasingly became associated with success in public affairs through rhetorical persuasion.

In the context of Athenian political life of the late fifth century B.C.E. the importance of skill in persuasive speech, or rhetoric, cannot be underestimated. The development of democracy made mastery of the spoken word not only a precondition of political success but also indispensable as a form of self-defence in the event that one was subject to a lawsuit. The sophists accordingly answered a growing need among the young and ambitious. Meno, an ambitious pupil of Gorgias, says that the aretē – and hence function – of a man is to rule over people, that is, manage his public affairs so as to benefit his friends and harm his enemies (73c-d). This is a long-standing ideal, but one best realised in democratic Athens through rhetoric. Rhetoric was thus the core of the sophistic education (Protagoras, 318e), even if most sophists professed to teach a broader range of subjects.

Suspicion towards the sophists was also informed by their departure from the aristocratic model of education (paideia). Since Homeric Greece, paideia had been the preoccupation of the ruling nobles and was based around a set of moral precepts befitting an aristocratic warrior class. The business model of the sophists presupposed that aretē could be taught to all free citizens, a claim that Protagoras implicitly defends in his great speech regarding the origins of justice. The sophists were thus a threat to the status quo because they made an indiscriminate promise – assuming capacity to pay fees – to provide the young and ambitious with the power to prevail in public life.

One could therefore loosely define sophists as paid teachers of aretē, where the latter is understood in terms of the capacity to attain and exercise political power through persuasive speech. This is only a starting point, however, and the broad and significant intellectual achievement of the sophists, which we will consider in the following two sections, has led some to ask whether it is possible or desirable to attribute them with a unique method or outlook that would serve as a unifying characteristic while also differentiating them from philosophers.

Scholarship in the nineteenth century and beyond has often fastened on method as a way of differentiating Socrates from the sophists. For Henry Sidgwick (1872, 288-307), for example, whereas Socrates employed a question-and-answer method in search of the truth, the sophists gave long epideictic or display speeches for the purposes of persuasion. It seems difficult to maintain a clear methodical differentiation on this basis, given that Gorgias and Protagoras both claimed proficiency in short speeches and that Socrates engages in long eloquent speeches – many in mythical form – throughout the Platonic dialogues. It is moreover simply misleading to say that the sophists were in all cases unconcerned with truth, as to assert the relativity of truth is itself to make a truth claim. A further consideration is that Socrates is guilty of fallacious reasoning in many of the Platonic dialogues, although this point is less relevant if we assume that Socrates’ logical errors are unintentional.

G.B. Kerferd (1981a) has proposed a more nuanced set of methodological criteria to differentiate Socrates from the sophists. According to Kerferd, the sophists employed eristic and antilogical methods of argument, whereas Socrates disdained the former and saw the latter as a necessary but incomplete step on the way towards dialectic. Plato uses the term eristic to denote the practice – it is not strictly speaking a method – of seeking victory in argument without regard for the truth. We find a representation of eristic techniques in Plato’s dialogue Euthydemus, where the brothers Euthydemus and Dionysiodorous deliberately use egregiously fallacious arguments for the purpose of contradicting and prevailing over their opponent. Antilogic is the method of proceeding from a given argument, usually that offered by an opponent, towards the establishment of a contrary or contradictory argument in such a way that the opponent must either abandon his first position or accept both positions. This method of argumentation was employed by most of the sophists, and examples are found in the works of Protagoras and Antiphon.

Kerferd’s claim that we can distinguish between philosophy and sophistry by appealing to dialectic remains problematic, however. In what are usually taken to be the “early” Platonic dialogues, we find Socrates’ employing a dialectical method of refutation referred to as the elenchus. As Nehamas has argued (1990), while the elenchus is distinguishable from eristic because of its concern with the truth, it is harder to differentiate from antilogic because its success is always dependent upon the capacity of interlocutors to defend themselves against refutation in a particular case. In Plato’s “middle” and “later” dialogues, on the other hand, according to Nehamas’ interpretation, Plato associates dialectic with knowledge of the forms, but this seemingly involves an epistemological and metaphysical commitment to a transcendent ontology that most philosophers, then and now, would be reluctant to uphold.

More recent attempts to explain what differentiates philosophy from sophistry have accordingly tended to focus on a difference in moral purpose or in terms of choices for different ways way of life, as Aristotle elegantly puts it (Metaphysics IV, 2, 1004b24-5). Section 4 will return to the question of whether this is the best way to think about the distinction between philosophy and sophistry. Before this, however, it is useful to sketch the biographies and interests of the most prominent sophists and also consider some common themes in their thought.

2. The Sophists

a. Protagoras

Protagoras of Abdera (c. 490-420 B.C.E.) was the most prominent member of the sophistic movement and Plato reports he was the first to charge fees using that title (Protagoras, 349a). Despite his animus towards the sophists, Plato depicts Protagoras as quite a sympathetic and dignified figure.

One of the more intriguing aspects of Protagoras’ life and work is his association with the great Athenian general and statesman Pericles (c. 495-429 B.C.E.). Pericles, who was the most influential statesman in Athens for more than 30 years, including the first two years of the Peloponnesian War, seems to have held a high regard for philosophers and sophists, and Protagoras in particular, entrusting him with the role of drafting laws for the Athenian foundation city of Thurii in 444 B.C.E.

From a philosophical perspective, Protagoras is most famous for his relativistic account of truth – in particular the claim that ‘man is the measure of all things’ – and his agnosticism concerning the Gods. The first topic will be discussed in section 3b. Protagoras’ agnosticism is famously articulated in the claim that ‘concerning the gods I am not in a position to know either that (or how) they are or that (or how) they are not, or what they are like in appearance; for there are many things that prevent knowledge, the obscurity of the matter and the brevity of human life’ (DK, 80B4). This seems to express a form of religious agnosticism not completely foreign to educated Athenian opinion. Despite this, according to tradition, Protagoras was convicted of impiety towards the end of his life. As a consequence, so the story goes, his books were burnt and he drowned at sea while departing Athens. It is perhaps significant in this context that Protagoras seems to have been the source of the sophistic claim to ‘make the weaker argument defeat the stronger’ parodied by Aristophanes.

Plato suggests that Protagoras sought to differ his educational offering from that of other sophists, such as Hippias, by concentrating upon instruction in aretē in the sense of political virtue rather than specialised studies such as astronomy and mathematics (Protagoras, 318e).

Apart from his works Truth and On the Gods, which deal with his relativistic account of truth and agnosticism respectively, Diogenes Laertius says that Protagoras wrote the following books: Antilogies, Art of Eristics, Imperative, On Ambition, On Incorrect Human Actions, On those in Hades, On Sciences, On Virtues, On Wrestling, On the Original State of Things and Trial over a Fee.

b. Gorgias

Gorgias of Leontini (c.485 - c.390 B.C.E.) is generally considered as a member of the sophistic movement, despite his disavowal of the capacity to teach aretē (Meno, 96c). The major focus of Gorgias was rhetoric and given the importance of persuasive speaking to the sophistic education, and his acceptance of fees, it is appropriate to consider him alongside other famous sophists for present purposes.

Gorgias visited Athens in 427 B.C.E. as the leader of an embassy from Leontini with the successful intention of persuading the Athenians to make an alliance against Syracuse. He travelled extensively around Greece, earning large sums of money by giving lessons in rhetoric and epideictic speeches.

Plato’s Gorgias depicts the rhetorician as something of a celebrity, who either does not have well thought out views on the implications of his expertise, or is reluctant to share them, and who denies his responsibility for the unjust use of rhetorical skill by errant students. Although Gorgias presents himself as moderately upstanding, the dramatic structure of Plato’s dialogue suggests that the defence of injustice by Polus and the appeal to the natural right of the stronger by Callicles are partly grounded in the conceptual presuppositions of Gorgianic rhetoric.

Gorgias’ original contribution to philosophy is sometimes disputed, but the fragments of his works On Not Being or Nature and Helen – discussed in detail in section 3c – feature intriguing claims concerning the power of rhetorical speech and a style of argumentation reminiscent of Parmenides and Zeno. Gorgias is also credited with other orations and encomia and a technical treatise on rhetoric titled At the Right Moment in Time.

c. Antiphon

The biographical details surrounding Antiphon the sophist (c. 470-411 B.C.) are unclear – one unresolved issue is whether he should be identified with Antiphon of Rhamnus (a statesman and teacher of rhetoric who was a member of the oligarchy which held power in Athens briefly in 411 B.C.E.). However, since the publication of fragments from his On Truth in the early twentieth century he has been regarded as a major representative of the sophistic movement.

On Truth, which features a range of positions and counterpositions on the relationship between nature and convention (see section 3a below), is sometimes considered an important text in the history of political thought because of its alleged advocacy of egalitarianism:

Those born of illustrious fathers we respect and honour, whereas those who come from an undistinguished house we neither respect nor honour. In this we behave like barbarians towards one another. For by nature we all equally, both barbarians and Greeks, have an entirely similar origin: for it is fitting to fulfil the natural satisfactions which are necessary to all men: all have the ability to fulfil these in the same way, and in all this none of us is different either as barbarian or as Greek; for we all breathe into the air with mouth and nostrils and we all eat with the hands (quoted in Untersteiner, 1954).

Whether this statement should be taken as expressing the actual views of Antiphon, or rather as part of an antilogical presentation of opposing views on justice remains an open question, as does whether such a position rules out the identification of Antiphon the sophist with the oligarchical Antiphon of Rhamnus.

d. Hippias

The exact dates for Hippias of Elis are unknown, but scholars generally assume that he lived during the same period as Protagoras. Whereas Plato’s depictions of Protagoras – and to a lesser extent Gorgias – indicate a modicum of respect, he presents Hippias as a comic figure who is obsessed with money, pompous and confused.

Hippias is best known for his polymathy (DK 86A14). His areas of expertise seem to have included astronomy, grammar, history, mathematics, music, poetry, prose, rhetoric, painting and sculpture. Like Gorgias and Prodicus, he served as an ambassador for his home city. His work as a historian, which included compiling lists of Olympic victors, was invaluable to Thucydides and subsequent historians as it allowed for a more precise dating of past events. In mathematics he is attributed with the discovery of a curve – the quadratrix – used to trisect an angle.

In terms of his philosophical contribution, Kerferd has suggested, on the basis of Plato’s Hippias Major (301d-302b), that Hippias advocated a theory that classes or kinds of thing are dependent on a being that traverses them. It is hard to make much sense of this alleged doctrine on the basis of available evidence. As suggested above, Plato depicts Hippias as philosophically shallow and unable to keep up with Socrates in dialectical discussion.

e. Prodicus

Prodicus of Ceos, who lived during roughly the same period as Protagoras and Hippias, is best known for his subtle distinctions between the meanings of words. He is thought to have written a treatise titled On the Correctness of Names.

Plato gives an amusing account of Prodicus’ method in the following passage of the Protagoras:

Prodicus spoke up next: … ‘those who attend discussions such as this ought to listen impartially, but not equally, to both interlocutors. There is a distinction here. We ought to listen impartially but not divide our attention equally: More should go to the wiser speaker and less to the more unlearned … In this way our meeting would take a most attractive turn, for you, the speakers, would then most surely earn the respect, rather than the praise, of those listening to you. For respect is guilelessly inherent in the souls of listeners, but praise is all too often merely a deceitful verbal expression. And then, too, we, your audience, would be most cheered, but not pleased, for to be cheered is to learn something, to participate in some intellectual activity; but to be pleased has to do with eating or experiencing some other pleasure in the body’ (337a-c).

Prodicus’ epideictic speech, The Choice of Heracles, was singled out for praise by Xenophon (Memorabilia, II.1.21-34) and in addition to his private teaching he seems to have served as an ambassador for Ceos (the birthplace of Simonides) on several occasions.

Socrates, although perhaps with some degree of irony, was fond of calling himself a pupil of Prodicus (Protagoras, 341a; Meno, 96d).

f. Thrasymachus

Thrasymachus was a well-known rhetorician in Athens in the latter part of the fifth century B.C.E., but our only surviving record of his views is contained in Plato’s Cleitophon and Book One of The Republic. He is depicted as brash and aggressive, with views on the nature of justice that will be examined in section 3a.

3. Major Themes of Sophistic Thought

a. Nature and Convention

The distinction between physis (nature) and nomos (custom, law, convention) was a central theme in Greek thought in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. and is especially important for understanding the work of the sophists. Before turning to sophistic considerations of these concepts and the distinction between them, it is worth sketching the meaning of the Greek terms.

Aristotle defines physis as ‘the substance of things which have in themselves as such a source of movement’ (Metaphysics, 1015a13-15). The term physis is closely connected with the Greek verb to grow (phuō) and the dynamic aspect of physis reflects the view that the nature of things is found in their origins and internal principles of change. Some of the Ionian thinkers now referred to as presocratics, including Thales and Heraclitus, used the term physis for reality as a whole, or at least its underlying material constituents, referring to the investigation of nature in this context as historia (inquiry) rather than philosophy.

The term nomos refers to a wide range of normative concepts extending from customs and conventions to positive law. It would be misleading to regard the term as referring only to arbitrary human conventions, as Heraclitus’ appeal to the distinction between human nomoi and the one divine nomos (DK 22B2 and 114) makes clear. Nonetheless, increased travel, as exemplified by the histories of Herodotus, led to a greater understanding of the wide array of customs, conventions and laws among communities in the ancient world. This recognition sets up the possibility of a dichotomy between what is unchanging and according to nature and what is merely a product of arbitrary human convention.

The dichotomy between physis and nomos seems to have been something of a commonplace of sophistic thought and was appealed to by Protagoras and Hippias among others. Perhaps the most instructive sophistic account of the distinction, however, is found in Antiphon’s fragment On Truth.

Antiphon applies the distinction to notions of justice and injustice, arguing that the majority of things which are considered just according to nomos are in direct conflict with nature and hence not truly or naturally just (DK 87 A44). The basic thrust of Antiphon’s argument is that laws and conventions are designed as a constraint upon our natural pursuit of pleasure. In a passage suggestive of the discussion on justice early in Plato’s Republic, Antiphon also asserts that one should employ justice to one’s advantage by regarding the laws as important when witnesses are present, but disregarding them when one can get away with it. Although these arguments may be construed as part of an antilogical exercise on nature and convention rather than prescriptions for a life of prudent immorality, they are consistent with views on the relation between human nature and justice suggested by Plato’s depiction of Callicles and Thrasymachus in the Gorgias and Republic respectively.

Callicles, a young Athenian aristocrat who may be a real historical figure or a creation of Plato’s imagination, was not a sophist; indeed he expresses disdain for them (Gorgias, 520a). His account of the relation between physis and nomos nonetheless owes a debt to sophistic thought. According to Callicles, Socrates’ arguments in favour of the claim that it is better to suffer injustice than to commit injustice trade on a deliberate ambiguity in the term justice. Callicles argues that conventional justice is a kind of slave morality imposed by the many to constrain the desires of the superior few. What is just according to nature, by contrast, is seen by observing animals in nature and relations between political communities where it can be seen that the strong prevail over the weak. Callicles himself takes this argument in the direction of a vulgar sensual hedonism motivated by the desire to have more than others (pleonexia), but sensual hedonism as such does not seem to be a necessary consequence of his account of natural justice.

Although the sophist Thrasymachus does not employ the physis/nomos distinction in Book One of the Republic, his account of justice (338d-354c) belongs within a similar conceptual framework. Like Callicles, Thrasymachus accuses Socrates of deliberate deception in his arguments, particularly in the claim the art of justice consists in a ruler looking after their subjects. According to Thrasymachus, we do better to think of the ruler/ruled relation in terms of a shepherd looking after his flock with a view to its eventual demise. Justice in conventional terms is simply a naive concern for the advantage of another. From another more natural perspective, justice is the rule of the stronger, insofar as rulers establish laws which persuade the multitude that it is just for them to obey what is to the advantage of the ruling few

An alternative, and more edifying, account of the relation between physis and nomos is found in Protagoras’ great speech (Protagoras, 320c-328d). According to Protagoras’ myth, man was originally set forth by the gods into a violent state of nature reminiscent of that later described by Hobbes. Our condition improved when Zeus bestowed us with shame and justice; these enabled us to develop the skill of politics and hence civilized communal relations and virtue. Apart from supporting his argument that aretē can be taught, this account suggests a defence of nomos on the grounds that nature by itself is insufficient for the flourishing of man considered as a political animal.

b. Relativism

The primary source on sophistic relativism about knowledge and/or truth is Protagoras’ famous ‘man is the measure’ statement. Interpretation of Protagoras’ thesis has always been a matter of controversy. Caution is needed in particular against the temptation to read modern epistemological concerns into Protagoras’ account and sophistic teaching on the relativity of truth more generally.

Protagoras measure thesis is as follows:

A human being is the measure of all things, of those things that are, that they are, and of those things that are not, that they are not (DK, 80B1).

There is near scholarly consensus that Protagoras is referring here to each human being as the measure of what is rather than ‘humankind’ as such, although the Greek term for ‘human’ –hōanthrōpos– certainly does not rule out the second interpretation. Plato’s Theaetetus (152a), however, suggests the first reading and I will assume its correctness here. On this reading we can regard Protagoras as asserting that if the wind, for example, feels (or seems) cold to me and feels (or seems) warm to you, then the wind is cold for me and is warm for you.

Another interpretative issue concerns whether we should construe Protagoras’ statement as primarily ontological or epistemological in intent. Scholarship by Kahn, Owen and Kerferd among others suggests that, while the Greeks lacked a clear distinction between existential and predicative uses of ‘to be’, they tended to treat existential uses as short for predicative uses.

Having sketched some of the interpretative difficulties surrounding Protagoras’ statement, we are still left with at least three possible readings (Kerferd, 1981a, 86). Protagoras could be asserting that (i) there is no mind-independent wind at all, but merely private subjective winds (ii) there is a wind that exists independently of my perception of it, but it is in itself neither cold nor warm as these qualities are private (iii) there is a wind that exists independently of my perception of it and this is both cold and warm insofar as two qualities can inhere in the same mind-independent ‘entity’.

All three interpretations are live options, with (i) perhaps the least plausible. Whatever the exact import of Protagoras’ relativism, however, the following passage from the Theaetetus suggests that it was also extended to the political and ethical realm:

Whatever in any particular city is considered just and admirable is just and admirable in that city, for so long as the convention remains in place (167c).

One difficulty this passage raises is that while Protagoras asserted that all beliefs are equally true, he also maintained that some are superior to others because they are more subjectively fulfilling for those who hold them. Protagoras thus seems to want it both ways, insofar as he removes an objective criterion of truth while also asserting that some subjective states are better than others. His appeal to better and worse beliefs could, however, be taken to refer to the persuasiveness and pleasure induced by certain beliefs and speeches rather than their objective truth.

The other major source for sophistic relativism is the Dissoi Logoi, an undated and anonymous example of Protagorean antilogic. In the Dissoi Logoi we find competing arguments on five theses, including whether the good and the bad are the same or different, and a series of examples of the relativity of different cultural practices and laws. Overall the Dissoi Logoi can be taken to uphold not only the relativity of truth but also what Barney (2006, 89) has called the variability thesis: whatever is good in some qualified way is also bad in another respect and the same is the case for a wide range of contrary predicates.

c. Language and Reality

Understandably given their educational program, the sophists placed great emphasis upon the power of speech (logos). Logos is a notoriously difficult term to translate and can refer to thought and that about which we speak and think as well as rational speech or language. The sophists were interested in particular with the role of human discourse in the shaping of reality. Rhetoric was the centrepiece of the curriculum, but literary interpretation of the work of poets was also a staple of sophistic education. Some philosophical implications of the sophistic concern with speech are considered in section 4, but in the current section it is instructive to concentrate on Gorgias’ account of the power of rhetorical logos.

The extant fragments attributed to the historical Gorgias indicate not only scepticism towards essential being and our epistemic access to this putative realm, but an assertion of the omnipotence of persuasive logos to make the natural and practical world conform to human desires. Reporting upon Gorgias’ speech About the Nonexistent or on Nature, Sextus says that the rhetorician, while adopting a different approach from that of Protagoras, also eliminated the criterion (DK, 82B3). The elimination of the criterion refers to the rejection of a standard that would enable us to distinguish clearly between knowledge and opinion about being and nature. Whereas Protagoras asserted that man is the measure of all things, Gorgias concentrated upon the status of truth about being and nature as a discursive construction.

About the Nonexistent or on Nature transgresses the injunction of Parmenides that one cannot say of what is that it is not. Employing a series of conditional arguments in the manner of Zeno, Gorgias asserts that nothing exists, that if it did exist it could not be apprehended, and if it was apprehended it could not be articulated in logos. The elaborate parody displays the paradoxical character of attempts to disclose the true nature of beings through logos:

For that by which we reveal is logos, but logos is not substances and existing things. Therefore we do not reveal existing things to our comrades, but logos, which is something other than substances (DK, 82B3)

Even if knowledge of beings was possible, its transmission in logos would always be distorted by the rift between substances and our apprehension and communication of them. Gorgias also suggests, even more provocatively, that insofar as speech is the medium by which humans articulate their experience of the world, logos is not evocative of the external, but rather the external is what reveals logos. An understanding of logos about nature as constitutive rather than descriptive here supports the assertion of the omnipotence of rhetorical expertise. Gorgias’ account suggests there is no knowledge of nature sub specie aeternitatis and our grasp of reality is always mediated by discursive interpretations, which, in turn, implies that truth cannot be separated from human interests and power claims.

In the Encomium to Helen Gorgias refers to logos as a powerful master (DK, 82B11). If humans had knowledge of the past, present or future they would not be compelled to adopt unpredictable opinion as their counsellor. The endless contention of astronomers, politicians and philosophers is taken to demonstrate that no logos is definitive. Human ignorance about non-existent truth can thus be exploited by rhetorical persuasion insofar as humans desire the illusion of certainty imparted by the spoken word:

The effect of logos upon the condition of the soul is comparable to the power of drugs over the nature of bodies. For just as different drugs dispel different secretions from the body, and some bring an end to disease and others to life, so also in the case of logoi, some distress, others delight, some cause fear, others make hearers bold, and some drug and bewitch the soul with a kind of evil persuasion (DK, 82B11).

All who have persuaded people, Gorgias says, do so by moulding a false logos. While other forms of power require force, logos makes all its willing slave.

This account of the relation between persuasive speech, knowledge, opinion and reality is broadly consistent with Plato’s depiction of the rhetorician in the Gorgias. Both Protagoras’ relativism and Gorgias’ account of the omnipotence of logos are suggestive of what we moderns might call a deflationary epistemic anti-realism.

4. The Distinction Between Philosophy and Sophistry

The distinction between philosophy and sophistry is in itself a difficult philosophical problem. This closing section examines the attempt of Plato to establish a clear line of demarcation between philosophy and sophistry.

As alluded to above, the terms ‘philosopher’ and ‘sophist’ were disputed in the fifth and fourth century B.C.E., the subject of contention between rival schools of thought. Histories of philosophy tend to begin with the Ionian ‘physicist’ Thales, but the presocratics referred to the activity they were engaged in as historia (inquiry) rather than philosophia and although it may have some validity as a historical projection, the notion that philosophy begins with Thales derives from the mid nineteenth century. It was Plato who first clearly and consistently refers to the activity of philosophia and much of what he has to say is best understood in terms of an explicit or implicit contrast with the rival schools of the sophists and Isocrates (who also claimed the title philosophia for his rhetorical educational program).

The related questions as to what a sophist is and how we can distinguish the philosopher from the sophist were taken very seriously by Plato. He also acknowledges the difficulty inherent in the pursuit of these questions and it is perhaps revealing that the dialogue dedicated to the task, Sophist, culminates in a discussion about the being of non-being. Socrates converses with sophists in Euthydemus, Hippias Major, Hippias Minor, Gorgias, Protagoras and the Republic and discusses sophists at length in the Apology, Sophist, Statesman and Theaetetus. It can thus be argued that the search for the sophist and distinction between philosophy and sophistry are not only central themes in the Platonic dialogues, but constitutive of the very idea and practice of philosophy, at least in its original sense as articulated by Plato.

This point has been recognised by recent poststructuralist thinkers such as Jacques Derrida and Jean Francois-Lyotard in the context of their project to place in question central presuppositions of the Western philosophical tradition deriving from Plato. Derrida attacks the interminable trial prosecuted by Plato against the sophists with a view to exhuming ‘the conceptual monuments marking out the battle lines between philosophy and sophistry’ (1981, 106). Lyotard views the sophists as in possession of unique insight into the sense in which discourses about what is just cannot transcend the realm of opinion and pragmatic language games (1985, 73-83).

The prospects for establishing a clear methodological divide between philosophy and sophistry are poor. Apart from the considerations mentioned in section 1, it would be misleading to say that the sophists were unconcerned with truth or genuine theoretical investigation and Socrates is clearly guilty of fallacious reasoning in many of the Platonic dialogues. In the Sophist, in fact, Plato implies that the Socratic technique of dialectical refutation represents a kind of ‘noble sophistry’ (Sophist, 231b).

This in large part explains why contemporary scholarship on the distinction between philosophy and sophistry has tended to focus on a difference in moral character. Nehamas, for example, has argued that ‘Socrates did not differ from the sophists in method but in overall purpose’ (1990, 13).  Nehamas relates this overall purpose to the Socratic elenchus, suggesting that Socrates’ disavowal of knowledge and of the capacity to teach aretē distances him from the sophists. However, this way of demarcating Socrates’ practice from that of his sophistic counterparts, Nehamas argues, cannot justify the later Platonic distinction between philosophy and sophistry, insofar as Plato forfeited the right to uphold the distinction once he developed a substantive philosophical teaching, that is, the theory of forms.

There is no doubt much truth in the claim that Plato and Aristotle depict the philosopher as pursuing a different way of life than the sophist, but to say that Plato defines the philosopher either through a difference in moral purpose, as in the case of Socrates, or a metaphysical presumption regarding the existence of transcendent forms, as in his later work, does not in itself adequately characterise Plato’s critique of his sophistic contemporaries. Once we attend to Plato’s own treatment of the distinction between philosophy and sophistry two themes quickly become clear: the mercenary character of the sophists and their overestimation of the power of speech. For Plato, at least, these two aspects of the sophistic education tell us something about the persona of the sophist as the embodiment of a distinctive attitude towards knowledge.

The fact that the sophists taught for profit may not seem objectionable to modern readers; most present-day university professors would be reluctant to teach pro bono. It is clearly a major issue for Plato, however. Plato can barely mention the sophists without contemptuous reference to the mercenary aspect of their trade: particularly revealing examples of Plato’s disdain for sophistic money-making and avarice are found at Apology 19d, Euthydemus 304b-c, Hippias Major 282b-e, Protagoras 312c-d and Sophist 222d-224d, and this is not an exhaustive list. Part of the issue here is no doubt Plato’s commitment to a way of life dedicated to knowledge and contemplation. It is significant that students in the Academy, arguably the first higher education institution, were not required to pay fees. This is only part of the story, however.

A good starting point is to consider the etymology of the term philosophia as suggested by the Phaedrus and Symposium. After completing his palinode in the Phaedrus, Socrates expresses the hope that he never be deprived of his ‘erotic’ art. Whereas the speechwriter Lysias presents erōs (desire, love) as an unseemly waste of expenditure (Phaedrus, 257a), in his later speech Socrates demonstrates how erōs impels the soul to rise towards the forms. The followers of Zeus, or philosophy, Socrates suggests, educate the object of their erōs to imitate and partake in the ways of the God. Similarly, in the Symposium, Socrates refers to an exception to his ignorance. Approving of the suggestion by Phaedrus that the drinking party eulogise erōs, Socrates states that ta erōtika (the erotic things) are the only subject concerning which he would claim to possess rigorous knowledge (Symposium, 177 d-e). When it is his turn to deliver a speech, Socrates laments his incapacity to compete with the Gorgias-influenced rhetoric of Agathon before delivering Diotima’s lessons on erōs, represented as a daimonion or semi-divine intermediary between the mortal and the divine. Erōs is thus presented as analogous to philosophy in its etymological sense, a striving after wisdom or completion that can only be temporarily fulfilled in this life by contemplation of the forms of the beautiful and the good (204a-b). The philosopher is someone who strives after wisdom – a friend or lover of wisdom – not someone who possesses wisdom as a finished product, as the sophists claimed to do and as their name suggests.

Plato’s emphasis upon philosophy as an ‘erotic’ activity of striving for wisdom, rather than as a finished state of completed wisdom, largely explains his distaste for sophistic money-making. The sophists, according to Plato, considered knowledge to be a ready-made product that could be sold without discrimination to all comers. The Theages, a Socratic dialogue whose authorship some scholars have disputed, but which expresses sentiments consistent with other Platonic dialogues, makes this point with particular clarity. The farmer Demodokos has brought his son, Theages, who is desirous of wisdom, to Socrates. As Socrates questions his potential pupil regarding what sort of wisdom he seeks, it becomes evident that Theages seeks power in the city and influence over other men. Since Theages is looking for political wisdom, Socrates refers him to the statesmen and the sophists. Disavowing his ability to compete with the expertise of Gorgias and Prodicus in this respect, Socrates nonetheless admits his knowledge of the erotic things, a subject about which he claims to know more than any man who has come before or indeed any of those to come (Theages, 128b). In response to the suggestion that he study with a sophist, Theages reveals his intention to become a pupil of Socrates. Perhaps reluctant to take on an unpromising pupil, Socrates insists that he must follow the commands of his daimonion, which will determine whether those associating with him are capable of making any progress (Theages, 129c). The dialogue ends with an agreement that all parties make trial of the daimonion to see whether it permits of the association.

One need only follow the suggestion of the Symposium that erōs is a daimonion to see that Socratic education, as presented by Plato, is concomitant with a kind of ‘erotic’ concern with the beautiful and the good, considered as natural in contrast to the purely conventional. Whereas the sophists accept pupils indiscriminately, provided they have the money to pay, Socrates is oriented by his desire to cultivate the beautiful and the good in promising natures. In short, the difference between Socrates and his sophistic contemporaries, as Xenophon suggests, is the difference between a lover and a prostitute. The sophists, for Xenophon’s Socrates, are prostitutes of wisdom because they sell their wares to anyone with the capacity to pay (Memorabilia, I.6.13). This – somewhat paradoxically – accounts for Socrates’ shamelessness in comparison with his sophistic contemporaries, his preparedness to follow the argument wherever it leads. By contrast, Protagoras and Gorgias are shown, in the dialogues that bear their names, as vulnerable to the conventional opinions of the paying fathers of their pupils, a weakness contributing to their refutation. The sophists are thus characterised by Plato as subordinating the pursuit of truth to worldly success, in a way that perhaps calls to mind the activities of contemporary advertising executives or management consultants.

The overestimation of the power of human speech is the other theme that emerges clearly from Plato’s (and Aristotle’s) critique of the sophists. In the Sophist, Plato says that dialectic – division and collection according to kinds – is the knowledge possessed by the free man or philosopher (Sophist, 253c). Here Plato reintroduces the difference between true and false rhetoric, alluded to in the Phaedrus, according to which the former presupposes the capacity to see the one in the many (Phaedrus, 266b). Plato’s claim is that the capacity to divide and synthesise in accordance with one form is required for the true expertise of logos. Whatever else one makes of Plato’s account of our knowledge of the forms, it clearly involves the apprehension of a higher level of being than sensory perception and speech. The philosopher, then, considers rational speech as oriented by a genuine understanding of being or nature. The sophist, by contrast, is said by Plato to occupy the realm of falsity, exploiting the difficulty of dialectic by producing discursive semblances, or phantasms, of true being (Sophist, 234c). The sophist uses the power of persuasive speech to construct or create images of the world and is thus a kind of ‘enchanter’ and imitator.

This aspect of Plato’s critique of sophistry seems particularly apposite in regard to Gorgias’ rhetoric, both as found in the Platonic dialogue and the extant fragments attributed to the historical Gorgias. In response to Socratic questioning, Gorgias asserts that rhetoric is an all-comprehending power that holds under itself all of the other activities and occupations (Gorgias, 456a). He later claims that it is concerned with the greatest good for man, namely those speeches that allow one to attain freedom and rule over others, especially, but not exclusively, in political settings (452d). As suggested above, in the context of Athenian public life the capacity to persuade was a precondition of political success. For present purposes, however, the key point is that freedom and rule over others are both forms of power: respectively power in the sense of liberty or capacity to do something, which suggests the absence of relevant constraints, and power in the sense of dominion over others. Gorgias is suggesting that rhetoric, as the expertise of persuasive speech, is the source of power in a quite comprehensive sense and that power is ‘the good’. What we have here is an assertion of the omnipotence of speech, at the very least in relation to the determination of human affairs.

The Socratic position, as becomes clear later in the discussion with Polus (466d-e), and is also suggested in Meno (88c-d) and Euthydemus (281d-e), is that power without knowledge of the good is not genuinely good. Without such knowledge not only ‘external’ goods, such as wealth and health, not only the areas of expertise that enable one to attain such so-called goods, but the very capacity to attain them is either of no value or harmful. This in large part explains the so-called Socratic paradox that virtue is knowledge.

Plato’s critique of the sophists’ overestimation of the power of speech should not be conflated with his commitment to the theory of the forms. For Plato, the sophist reduces thinking to a kind of making: by asserting the omnipotence of human speech the sophist pays insufficient regard to the natural limits upon human knowledge and our status as seekers rather than possessors of knowledge (Sophist, 233d). This critique of the sophists does perhaps require a minimal commitment to a distinction between appearance and reality, but it is an oversimplification to suggest that Plato’s distinction between philosophy and sophistry rests upon a substantive metaphysical theory, in large part because our knowledge of the forms for Plato is itself inherently ethical. Plato, like his Socrates, differentiates the philosopher from the sophist primarily through the virtues of the philosopher’s soul (McKoy, 2008). Socrates is an embodiment of the moral virtues, but love of the forms also has consequences for the philosopher’s character.

There is a further ethical and political aspect to the Platonic and Aristotelian critique of the sophists’ overestimation of the power of speech. In Book Ten of Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle suggests that the sophists tended to reduce politics to rhetoric (1181a12-15) and overemphasised the role that could be played by rational persuasion in the political realm. Part of Aristotle’s point is that there is an element to living well that transcends speech. As Hadot eloquently puts it, citing Greek and Roman sources, ‘traditionally people who developed an apparently philosophical discourse without trying to live their lives in accordance with their discourse, and without their discourse emanating from their life experience, were called sophists’ (2004, 174).

The testimony of Xenophon, a Greek general and man of action, is instructive here. In his treatise on hunting, (Cynēgeticus, 13.1-9), Xenophon commends Socratic over sophistic education in aretē, not only on the grounds that the sophists hunt the young and rich and are deceptive, but also because they are men of words rather than action. The importance of consistency between one’s words and actions if one is to be truly virtuous is a commonplace of Greek thought, and this is one important respect in which the sophists, at least from the Platonic-Aristotelian perspective, fell short.

One might think that a denial of Plato’s demarcation between philosophy and sophistry remains well-motivated simply because the historical sophists made genuine contributions to philosophy. But this does not entail the illegitimacy of Plato’s distinction. Once we recognise that Plato is pointing primarily to a fundamental ethical orientation relating to the respective personas of the philosopher and sophist, rather than a methodological or purely theoretical distinction, the tension dissolves. This is not to deny that the ethical orientation of the sophist is likely to lead to a certain kind of philosophising, namely one which attempts to master nature, human and external, rather than understand it as it is.

Sophistry for Socrates, Plato and Aristotle represents a choice for a certain way of life, embodied in a particular attitude towards knowledge which views it as a finished product to be transmitted to all comers. Plato’s distinction between philosophy and sophistry is not simply an arbitrary viewpoint in a dispute over naming rights, but is rather based upon a fundamental difference in ethical orientation. Neither is this orientation reducible to concern with truth or the cogency of one’s theoretical constructs, although it is not unrelated to these. Where the philosopher differs from the sophist is in terms of the choice for a way of life that is oriented by the pursuit of knowledge as a good in itself while remaining cognisant of the necessarily provisional nature of this pursuit.

5. References and Further Reading

Translations are from the Cooper collected works edition of Plato and the Sprague edition of the sophists unless otherwise indicated. The reference list below is restricted to a few basic sources; readers interested to learn more about the sophists are advised to consult the excellent overviews by Barney (2006) and Kerferd (1981a) for a more comprehensive list of secondary literature.

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristophanes, Clouds, K.J. Dover (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. 1970.
  • Barnes, J. (ed.). 1984. The Complete Works of Aristotle, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • Diels, H. 1951. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Berlin: Weidman.
  • Cooper, J.M. (ed.). 1997. Plato: Complete Works. Indianopolis: Hackett.
  • Hudson-Williams. T. 1910. Theognis: Elegies and other elegies included in the Theognideansylloge. London: G.Bell.
  • Phillips, A.A. and Willcock, M.M (eds.). 1999. Xenophon &Arrian, On hunting (Kynēgetikos). Warminster: Aris& Phillips.
  • Sprague, R. 1972. The Older Sophists. South Carolina: University of South Carolina Press.
  • Xenophon, Memorabilia, trans. A.L. Bonnette, Ithaca: Cornell University Press. 1994.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Barney, R. 2006. ‘The Sophistic Movement’, in M.L. Gill and P. Pellegrin (eds.), A Companion to Ancient Philosophy, 77-97. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Gibert, J. 2003. ‘The Sophists.’ In C. Shields (ed.), The Blackwell Guide to Ancient Philosophy, 27-50. Oxford, Blackwell.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. 1971. The Sophists. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kerferd, G.B. 1981a. The Sophistic Movement. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kerferd, G.B. 1981b. The Sophists and their Legacy. Wiesbaden: Steiner.
  • Sidgwick, H. 1872. ‘The Sophists’.Journal of Philology 4, 289.
  • Untersteiner, M. 1954. The Sophists.trans. K. Freeman. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

c. Other Reading

  • Adkins, A. 1960.Merit and Responsibility. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Benardete, S. 1991. The Rhetoric of Morality and Philosophy. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Bett, R. 1989. 'The Sophists and Relativism.’Phronesis 34, 139-69.
  • Bett, R. 2002. ‘Is There a Sophistic Ethics?’ Ancient Philosophy, 22, 235-62.
  • Derrida, J. 1981. Dissemination, trans. B. Johnson. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Grote, G. 1904. A History of Greece vol.7. London: John Murray.
  • Hadot, P. 2004. What is Ancient Philosophy? Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Harrison, E.L. 1964. 'Was Gorgias a Sophist?' Phoenix vol. 18.3.
  • Hegel, G.W.F. 1995. Lectures on the History of Philosophy, trans. E.S. Haldane, Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press (original work published 1840).
  • Irwin, T.H. 1995. ‘Plato’s Objections to the Sophists’. In C.A. Powell (ed.), The Greek World, 568-87. London: Routledge.
  • Jarratt, S. 1991. Rereading the Sophists. Carbondale: Southern Illinois Press.
  • Kahn, Charles. 1983. 'Drama and Dialectic in Plato's Gorgias' in Julia Annas (ed.) Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy vol. 1. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kennedy, G. 1963. The Art of Persuasion in Ancient Greece, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Lyotard, J.F. and Thébaud, J-L. 1985.  Just Gaming, trans. W. Godzich. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • McCoy, M. 2008. Plato on the Rhetoric of Philosophers and Sophists.Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nehamas, A. 1990. ‘Eristic, Antilogic, Sophistic, Dialectic: Plato’s Demarcation of Philosophy from Sophistry’. History of Philosophy Quarterly, 7, 3-16.
  • Wardy, Robert. 1996. The Birth of Rhetoric: Gorgias, Plato and their successors. London: Routledge.


Author Information

George Duke
Deakin University

Aristotle: Logic

Aristotelian logic, after a great and early triumph, consolidated its position of influence to rule over the philosophical world throughout the Middle Ages up until the 19th Century.  All that changed in a hurry when modern logicians embraced a new kind of mathematical logic and pushed out what they regarded as the antiquated and clunky method of syllogisms.  Although Aristotle’s very rich and expansive account of logic differs in key ways from modern approaches, it is more than a historical curiosity.  It provides an alternative way of approaching logic and continues to provide critical insights into contemporary issues and concerns.  The main thrust of this article is to explain Aristotle’s logical system as a whole while correcting some prominent misconceptions that persist in the popular understanding and even in some of the specialized literature.  Before getting down to business, it is important to point out that Aristotle is a synoptic thinker with an over-arching theory that ties together all aspects and fields of philosophy.  He does not view logic as a separate, self-sufficient subject-matter, to be considered in isolation from other aspects of disciplined inquiry.  Although we cannot consider all the details of his encyclopedic approach, we can sketch out the larger picture in a way that illuminates the general thrust of his system.  For the purposes of this entry, let us define logic as that field of inquiry which investigates how we reason correctly (and, by extension, how we reason incorrectly).  Aristotle does not believe that the purpose of logic is to prove that human beings can have knowledge.  (He dismisses excessive scepticism.)  The aim of logic is the elaboration of a coherent system that allows us to investigate, classify, and evaluate good and bad forms of reasoning.

Table of Contents

  1. The Organon
  2. Categories
  3. From Words into Propositions
  4. Kinds of Propositions
  5. Square of Opposition
  6. Laws of Thought
  7. Existential Assumptions
  8. Form versus Content
  9. The Syllogism
  10. Inductive Syllogism
  11. Deduction versus Induction
  12. Science
  13. Non-Discursive Reasoning
  14. Rhetoric
  15. Fallacies
  16. Moral Reasoning
  17. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Organon

To those used to the silver tones of an accomplished writer like Plato, Aristotle’s prose will seem, at first glance, a difficult read.  What we have are largely notes, written at various points in his career, for different purposes, edited and cobbled together by later followers.  The style of the resulting collection is often rambling, repetitious, obscure, and disjointed.  There are many arcane, puzzling, and perhaps contradictory passages.  This problem is compounded by the abstract, technical vocabulary logic sometimes requires and by the wide-ranging scope and the scattered nature of Aristotle’s observations.  Some familiarity with Greek terminology is required if one hopes to capture the nuances in his thought.  Classicists and scholars do argue, of course, about the precise Greek meaning of key words or phrases but many of these debates involve minor points of interpretation that cannot concern us here.  Aristotle’s logical vocabulary needs to be understood within the larger context of his system as a whole.  Many good translations of Aristotle are available.  (Parenthetical citations below include the approximate Bekker number (the scholarly notation for referring to Aristotelian passages according to page, column, and line number of a standard edition), the English title of the work, and the name of the translator.)

Ancient commentators regarded logic as a widely-applicable instrument or method for careful thinking.  They grouped Aristotle’s six logical treatises into a sort of manual they called the Organon (Greek for “tool”).  The Organon included the Categories, On Interpretation, the Prior Analytics, the Posterior Analytics, the Topics, and On Sophistical Refutations.  These books touch on many issues: the logical structure of propositions, the proper structure of arguments (syllogisms), the difference between induction and deduction, the nature of scientific knowledge, basic fallacies (forms of specious reasoning), debating techniques, and so on.  But we cannot confine our present investigations to the Organon.  Aristotle comments on the principle of non-contradiction in the Metaphysics, on less rigorous forms of argument in the Rhetoric, on the intellectual virtues in the Nicomachean Ethics, on the difference between truth and falsity in On the Soul, and so on.  We cannot overlook such important passages if we wish to gain an adequate understanding of Aristotelian logic.

2. Categories

The world, as Aristotle describes it in his Categories, is composed of substances—separate, individual things—to which various characterizations or properties can be ascribed.  Each substance is a unified whole composed of interlocking parts.  There are two kinds of substances.  A primary substance is (in the simplest instance) an independent (or detachable) object, composed of matter, characterized by form.  Individual living organisms—a man, a rainbow trout, an oak tree—provide the most unambiguous examples of primary substances.  Secondary substances are the larger groups, the species or genera, to which these individual organisms belong.  So man, horse, mammals, animals (and so on) would be examples of secondary substances.  As we shall see, Aristotle’s logic is about correctly attributing specific properties to secondary substances (and therefore, indirectly, about attributing these properties to primary substances or individual things).

Aristotle elaborates a logic that is designed to describe what exists in the world.  We may well wonder then, how many different ways can we describe something?  In his Categories (4.1b25-2a4), Aristotle enumerates ten different ways of describing something.  These categories (Greek=kategoria, deriving from the verb to indicate, signify) include (1) substance, (2) quantity, (3) quality, (4) relation, (5) where, (6) when, (7) being-in-a-position, (8) possessing, (9) doing or (10) undergoing something or being affected by something.  In the Topics (I.9, 103b20-25), he includes the same list, replacing “substance” (ousia) with “essence” (ti esti).  We can, along with Aristotle, give an example of each kind of description: (1) to designate something as a “horse” or a “man” is to identify it as a substance or to attribute an essence to it; (2) to say that the wall is four feet long is to describe it in terms of quantity; (3) to say that the roof  is “white” is to ascribe a quality to it; (4) to say that your weight is “double” mine is to describe a relation between the two; (5) to say something happened in the market-place is to explain where; (6) to say it happened last year is to explain when; (7) to say an old man is sitting is to describe his position; (8) to say the girl has shoes on is to describe what she possesses; (9) to say the head chef is cutting a carrot with a knife is to describe what he is doing; and finally, (10) to say wood is being burned in the fireplace is to describe what it means for the wood to undergo burning or to be affected by fire.  Commentators claim that these ten categories represent either different descriptions of being or different kinds of being.  (To be a substance is to be in a certain way; to possess quantity is to be in a certain way; to possess a quality is to be in a certain way, and so on.)  There is nothing magical about the number ten.  Aristotle gives shorter lists elsewhere. (Compare Posterior Analytics, I.22.83a22-24, where he lists seven predications, for example).  Whether Aristotle intends the longer lists as a complete enumeration of all conceivable types of descriptions is an open question.  Scholars have noticed that the first category, substance or essence, seems to be fundamentally different than the others; it is what something is in the most complete and perfect way.

3. From Words into Propositions

Aristotle does not believe that all reasoning deals with words.  (Moral decision-making is, for Aristotle, a form of reasoning that can occur without words.)  Still, words are a good place to begin our study of his logic.  Logic, as we now understand it, chiefly has to do with how we evaluate arguments.  But arguments are made of statements, which are, in turn, made of words.  In Aristotelian logic, the most basic statement is a proposition, a complete sentence that asserts something.  (There are other kinds of sentences—prayers, questions, commands—that do not assert anything true or false about the world and which, therefore, exist outside the purview of logic.)  A proposition is ideally composed of at least three words: a subject (a word naming a substance), a predicate (a word naming a property), and a connecting verb, what logicians call a copula (Latin, for “bond” or “connection”).  Consider the simple statement: “Socrates is wise.”  Socrates is the subject; the property of being wise is the predicate, and the verb “is” (the copula) links Socrates and wisdom together in a single affirmation.  We can express all this symbolically as “S is P” where “S” stands for the subject “Socrates” and “P” stands for the predicate “being wise.”  The sentence “Socrates is wise” (or symbolically, “S is P”) qualifies as a proposition; it is a statement that claims that something is true about the world.  Paradigmatically, the subject would be a (secondary) substance (a natural division of primary substances) and the predicate would be a necessary or essential property as in:  “birds are feathered,” or “triangles have interior angles equal to two right angles,” or “fire is upward-moving.”  But any overly restrictive metaphysical idea about what terms in a proposition mean seems to unnecessarily restrict intelligent discourse.  Suppose someone were to claim that “anger is unethical.”  But anger is not a substance; it is a property of a substance (an organism).  Still, it makes perfect sense to predicate properties of anger.  We can say that anger is unethical, hard to control, an excess of passion, familiar enough, and so on.  Aristotle himself exhibits some flexibility here.  Still, there is something to Aristotle’s view that the closer a proposition is to the metaphysical structure of the world, the more it counts as knowledge.  Aristotle has an all-embracing view of logic and yet believes that, what we could call “metaphysical correctness” produces a more rigorous, scientific form of logical expression.

Of course, it is not enough to produce propositions; what we are after is true propositions.  Aristotle believes that only propositions are true or false.  Truth or falsity (at least with respect to linguistic expression) is a matter of combining words into complete propositions that purport to assert something about the world.  Individual words or incomplete phrases, considered by themselves, are neither true or false.  To say, “Socrates,” or “jumping up and down,” or “brilliant red” is not to assert anything true or false about the world.  It is to repeat words without making any claim about the way things are.  In the Metaphysics, Aristotle provides his own definition of true and false: “to say of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not, is true”; and “to say of what is that it is not, or of what is not that it is, is false.” (IV.7.1011b25, Ross.)  In other words, a true proposition corresponds to way things are.  But Aristotle is not proposing a correspondence theory of truth as an expert would understand it.  He is operating at a more basic level.  Consider the statement: “Spiders have eight legs.”  (Symbolically, “All S is P,” where S, the subject, is “spiders”; P, the predicate, is “the state of being eight-legged,” and the verb “is” functions as the copula.)  What does it mean to say that this claim is true?  If we observe spiders to discover how many legs they have, we will find that (except in a few odd cases) spiders do have eight legs, so the proposition will be true because what it says matches reality.  As we shall see, Aristotle’s logic is designed to produce just this kind of general statement.

4. Kinds of Propositions

Aristotle suggests that all propositions must either affirm or deny something.  Every proposition must be either an affirmation or a negation; it cannot be both.  He also points out that propositions can make claims about what necessarily is the case, about what possibly is the case, or even about what is impossible.  His modal logic, which deals with these further qualifications about possibility or necessity, presents difficulties of interpretation.  We will focus on his assertoric (or non-modal) logic here.  Still, many of Aristotle’s points about necessity and possibility seem highly intuitive.  In one famous example about a hypothetical sea battle, he observes that the necessary truth of a mere proposition does not trump the uncertainty of future events.  Because it is necessarily true that there will be or will not be a sea battle tomorrow, we cannot conclude that either alternative is necessarily true.  (De Interpretatione, 9.19a30ff.)  So the necessity that attaches to the proposition “there will or will not be a sea battle tomorrow” does not transfer over to the claim ‘that there will be a sea battle tomorrow” or to the claim “there will not be a sea battle tomorrow.”  Aristotle goes out of his way to emphasize the point that our personal beliefs about what will happen in the future do not determine whether the individual propositions are true.  (Note that we must not confuse the necessary truth of a proposition with the necessity that precipitates the conclusion of a deductively-valid argument. The former is sometimes called “material,” “non-logical,” or “metaphysical” necessity; the later, “formal,” “deductive,” or “logical” necessity.”  We discuss these issues further below.)

Aristotle claims that all propositions can be expressed using the “Subject copula Predicate” formula and that complex propositions are, on closer inspection, collections of simpler claims that display, in turn, this fundamental structure.  Having fixed the proper logical form of a proposition, he goes on to classify different kinds of propositions.  He begins by distinguishing between particular terms and universal terms.  (The term he uses for “universal” is the Greek “katholou.”)  Particular terms refer to individual things; universal terms refer to groups of things.  The name “Socrates” is a particular term because it refers to a single human being; the word “spiders” is a universal term for it universally applies to all members of the group “spiders.”  Aristotle realizes, of course, that universal terms may be used to refer to parts of a group as well as to entire groups.  We may claim that all spiders have eight legs or that only some spiders have book-lungs.  In the first case, a property, eight-leggedness, is predicated of the entire group referred to by the universal term; in the second case, the property of having book-lungs is predicated of only part of the group.  So, to use Aristotelian language, one may predicate a property universally or not universally of the group referred to by a universal term.

This brings us to Aristotle’s classification of the four different kinds of categorical propositions (called “categorical propositions” because they assert a relationship between two categories or kinds).  Each different categorical proposition possesses quantity insomuch as it represents a universal or a particular predication (referring to all or only some members of the subject class).  It also possesses a definite quality (positive or negative) insomuch as it affirms or denies the specified predication.  The adjectives “all,” “no,” and “some” (which is understood as meaning “at least one”) determine the quantity of the proposition; the quality is determined by whether the verb is in the affirmative or the negative.  Rather than going into the details of Aristotle’s original texts, suffice it to say that contemporary logicians generally distinguish between four logical possibilities:

1.  Universal Affirmation: All S are P (called A statements from the Latin, “AFFIRMO”: I affirm).

2.  Universal Negation: No S are P (called E statements from “NEGO”: I deny).

3.  Particular Affirmation: Some S are P (called I statements from AFFIRMO).

4.  Particular Negation: Some S are not P (called O statements from NEGO).

Note that these four possibilities are not, in every instance, mutually exclusive.  As mentioned above, particular statements using the modifier “some” refer to at least one member of a group.  To say that “some S are P” is to say that “at least one S is P”; to say that “some S are not P” is to say that “at least one S is not P.”  It must follow then (at least on Aristotle’s system) that universal statements require the corresponding particular statement.  If “All S are P,” at least one S must be P; that is, the particular statement “Some S are P” must be true.  Again, if “No S are P,” at least one S must not be P; that is, the particular statement “Some S are not P” must be true.  (More on this, with qualifications, below.)  Note also that Aristotle treats propositions with an individual subject such as “Socrates is wise” as universal propositions (as if the proposition was saying something like “all instances of Socrates” are wise.)  One caveat:  Although we cannot linger on further complications here, keep in mind that this is not the only way to divide up logical possibility.

5. Square of Opposition

Aristotle examines the way in which these four different categorical propositions are related to one another.  His views have come down to us as “the square of opposition,” a mnemonic diagram that captures, systematizes, and slightly extends what Aristotle says in De Interpretatione. (Cf. 6.17a25ff.)

Figure 1

The Traditional Square of Opposition


As it turns out, we can use a square with crossed interior diagonals (Fig. 1 above) to identify four kinds of relationships that hold between different pairs of categorical propositions.  Consider each relationship in turn.

1)  Contradictory propositions possess opposite truth-values.  In the diagram, they are linked by a diagonal line.  If one of two contradictories is true, the other must be false, and vice versa.  So the A proposition (All S are P) and the O proposition (Some S are not P) are contradictories.  Clearly, if it is true that “all S are P,” then the O statement that “some S are not P” must be false.  And if it is true that “some S are not P,” then the A statement that “all S are P” must be false.  The same relationship holds between E (No S are P) and I (Some S are P) propositions.  To use a simple example: If it is true that “all birds lay eggs,” then it must be false that “some birds do not lay eggs.”  And if it is true that “some birds do not fly,” then it must be false that “all birds fly.”

2)  Contrary propositions cannot both be true.  The top horizontal line in the square joining the A proposition (All S are P) to the E proposition (No S are P) represents this logical relationship.  Clearly, it cannot be true that “all S are P” and that “no S are P.”  The truth of one of these contrary propositions excludes the truth of the other.  It is possible, however, that both statements are false as in the case where some S are P and some (other) S are not P.  So, for example, the statements “all politicians tell lies” and “no politicians tell lies” cannot both be true.  They will, however, both be false if it is indeed the case that some politicians tell lies whereas some do not.

3)  The relationship of subalternation results when the truth of a universal proposition, “the superaltern,” requires the truth of a second particular proposition, “the subaltern.”  The vertical lines moving downward from the top to the bottom of the square in the diagram represent this condition.  Clearly, if all members of an existent group possess (or do not possess) a specific characteristic, it must follow that any smaller subset of that group must possess (or not possess) that specific characteristic.  If the A proposition (All S are P) is true, it must follow that the I proposition (“Some S are P”) must be true.  Again, if the E proposition (No S are P) is true, it must follow that the O proposition (Some S are not P) must be true.  Consider, for example, the statement, “all cheetahs are fast.”  If every member of the whole group of cheetahs is fast, then it must be the case that at least one member of the group of cheetahs is fast; that is, the statement “some cheetahs are fast” must be true.  And, to reformulate the same example as a negation, if it is true that “no cheetahs are slow,” then it must be the case that at least one member of the group of cheetahs is not slow; that is, the statement “some cheetahs are not slow” must be true.

Note that subalternation does not work in the opposite direction.  If “Some S are P,” it need not follow that “All S are P.”  And if “Some S are not P,” it need not follow that “No S are P.”  We should also point out that if the subaltern is false, it must follow that the superaltern is false.  If it is false to say that “Some S are P,” it must be false to say that “All S are P.”  And if it is false to say that “Some S are not P,” it must be false to say that “No S are P.”

4)  Subcontrary propositions cannot both be false.  The bottom horizontal line in the square joining the I proposition (Some S are P) to the O proposition (Some S are not P) represents this kind of subcontrary relationship.  Keeping to the assumptions implicit in Aristotle’s system, there are only three possibilities: (1) All S have property P; in which case, it must also be true (by subalternation) that “some S are P.”  (2) No S have property P; in which case it must also be true (by subalternation) that “some S are not P.”  (3)  Some S have and some S do not have property P; in which case it will be true that “some S are P” and that “some S are not P.”  It follows that at least one of a pair of subcontrary propositions must be true and that both will be true in cases where P is partially predicated of S.  So, for example, both members of the subcontrary pair “some men have beards” and “some men do not have beards” are true.  They are both true because having a beard is a contingent or variable male attribute.  In contrast, only one member of the subcontrary pair “some snakes are legless” and “some snakes are not legless” is true.  As all snakes are legless, the proposition “some snakes are not legless” must be false.

Traditional logicians, inspired by Aristotle’s wide-ranging comments, identified a series of “immediate inferences” as a way of deriving new propositions through a routine rearrangement of terms.  Subalternation is an obvious example of immediate inference.  From “All S are P” we can immediately infer—that is, without argument—that “some S are P.”  They also recognized conversion, obversion, and contraposition as immediate inferences.

In conversion, one interchanges the S and P terms.  If, for example, we know that “No S is P,” we can immediately infer that “No P is S.”  (Once we know that “no circles are triangles,” we know right away that “no triangles are circles.”)

In obversion, one negates the predicate term while replacing it with the predicate term of opposite quality.  If, for example, we know that “Some S are P,” we can immediately infer the obverse, “Some S are not non-P.”  (Once we know that “some students are happy,” we know right away that “some students are not unhappy.”)

Finally, in contraposition, one negates both terms and reverses their order.  If, for example, we know that “All S are P,” we can infer the contrapositive “All non-P are non-S.”  (Once we know that “all voters are adults,” we know right away that “all children are unable to vote.”)  More specific rules, restrictions, and details are readily available elsewhere.

6. Laws of Thought

During the 18th, 19th, and early 20th Century, scholars who saw themselves as carrying on the Aristotelian and Medieval tradition in logic, often pointed to the “laws of thought” as the basis of all logic.  One still encounters this approach in textbook accounts of informal logic.  The usual list of logical laws (or logical first principles) includes three axioms: the law of identity, the law of non-contradiction, and the law of excluded middle.  (Some authors include a law of sufficient reason, that every event or claim must have a sufficient reason or explanation, and so forth.)  It would be a gross simplification to argue that these ideas derive exclusively from Aristotle or to suggest (as some authors seem to imply) that he self-consciously presented a theory uniquely derived from these three laws.  The idea is rather that Aristotle’s theory presupposes these principles and/or that he discusses or alludes to them somewhere in his work.  Traditional logicians did not regard them as abstruse or esoteric doctrines but as manifestly obvious principles that require assent for logical discourse to be possible.

The law of identity could be summarized as the patently unremarkable but seemingly inescapable notion that things must be, of course, identical with themselves.  Expressed symbolically: “A is A,” where A is an individual, a species, or a genus.  Although Aristotle never explicitly enunciates this law, he does observe, in the Metaphysics, that “the fact that a thing is itself is [the only] answer to all such questions as why the man is man, or the musician musical.” (VII.17.1041a16-18, Ross.)  This suggests that he does accept, unsurprisingly, the perfectly obvious idea that things are themselves.  If, however, identical things must possess identical attributes, this opens the door to various logical maneuvers.  One can, for example, substitute equivalent terms for one another and, even more portentously, one can arrive at some conception of analogy and induction.  Aristotle writes, “all water is said to be . . .  the same as all water  . . .  because of a certain likeness.” (Topics, I.7.103a19-20, Pickard-Cambridge.)  If water is water, then by the law of identity, anything we discover to be water must possess the same water-properties.

Aristotle provides several formulations of the law of non-contradiction, the idea that logically correct propositions cannot affirm and deny the same thing:

“It is impossible for anyone to believe the same thing to be and not be.” (Metaphysics, IV.3.1005b23-24, Ross.)

“The same attribute cannot at the same time belong and not belong to the same subject in the same respect.” (Ibid., IV.3.1005b19-20.)

“The most indisputable of all beliefs is that contradictory statements are not at the same time true.” (Ibid., IV.6.1011b13-14.)

Symbolically, the law of non-contradiction is sometimes represented as “not (A and not A).”

The law of excluded middle can be summarized as the idea that every proposition must be either true or false, not both and not neither.  In Aristotle’s words, “It is necessary for the affirmation or the negation to be true or false.”  (De Interpretatione, 9.18a28-29, Ackrill.)  Symbolically, we can represent the law of excluded middle as an exclusive disjunction: “A is true or A is false,” where only one alternative holds.  Because every proposition must be true or false, it does not follow, of course, that we can know if a particular proposition is true or false.

Despite perennial challenges to these so-called laws (by intuitionists, dialetheists, and others), Aristotelians inevitably claim that such counterarguments hinge on some unresolved ambiguity (equivocation), on a conflation of what we know with what is actually the case, on a false or static account of identity, or on some other failure to fully grasp the implications of what one is saying.

7. Existential Assumptions

Before we move on to consider Aristotle’s account of the syllogism, we need to clear up some widespread misconceptions and explain a few things about Aristotle’s project as a whole.  Criticisms of Aristotle’s logic often assume that what Aristotle was trying to do coincides with the basic project of modern logic.  Begin with the usual criticism brought against the traditional square of opposition.  For reasons we will not explore, modern logicians assume that universal claims about non-existent objects (or empty sets) are true but that particular claims about them are false.  On this reading, the claim that “all fairy-god mothers are beautiful” is true, whereas the claim that “some fairy-god mothers are beautiful” is false.  Clearly, this clashes with the traditional square of opposition.  By simple subalternation, the truth of the proposition “all fairy-god mothers are beautiful” requires the truth of the proposition “some fairy-god mothers are beautiful.”  If the first claim is true, the second claim must also be true.  For this and similar reasons, some modern logicians dismiss the traditional square as inadequate, claiming that Aristotle made a mistake or overlooked relevant issues.  Aristotle, however, is involved in a specialized project.  He elaborates an alternative logic, specifically adapted to the problems he is trying to solve.

Aristotle devises a companion-logic for science.  He relegates fictions like fairy godmothers and mermaids and unicorns to the realms of poetry and literature.  In his mind, they exist outside the ambit of science.  This is why he leaves no room for such non-existent entities in his logic.  This is a thoughtful choice, not an inadvertent omission.  Technically, Aristotelian science is a search for definitions, where a definition is “a phrase signifying a thing’s essence.” (Topics, I.5.102a37, Pickard-Cambridge.)  To possess an essence—is literally to possess a “what-it-is-to-be” something (to ti ēn einai).  Because non-existent entities cannot be anything, they do not, in Aristotle’s mind, possess an essence.  They cannot be defined.  Aristotle makes this point explicitly in the Posterior Analytics.  He points out that a definition of a goat-stag, a cross between a goat and a deer (the ancient equivalent of a unicorn), is impossible.  He writes, “no one knows the nature of what does not exist—[we] can know the meaning of the phrase or name ‘goat-stag’ but not what the essential nature of a goat-stag is.” (II.7.92b6-8, Mure.)  Because we cannot know what the essential nature of a goat-stag is—indeed, it has no essential nature—we cannot provide a proper definition of a goat-stag.  So the study of goat-stags (or unicorns) is not open to scientific investigation.  Aristotle sets about designing a logic that is intended to display relations between scientific propositions, where science is understood as a search for essential definitions.  This is why he leaves no place for fictional entities like goat-stags (or unicorns).  Hence, the assumed validity of a logical maneuver like subalternation.

8. Form versus Content

However, this is not the only way Aristotle’s approach parts ways with more modern assumptions.  Some modern logicians might define logic as that philosophical inquiry which considers the form not the content of propositions.  Aristotle’s logic is unapologetically metaphysical.  We cannot properly understand what Aristotle is about by separating form from content.  Suppose, for example, I was to claim that (1) all birds have feathers and (2) that everyone in the Tremblay family wears a red hat.  These two claims possess the same very same propositional form, A.  We can represent the first claim as: “All S are P,” where S=birds, and P=being feathered.  And we can also represent the second claim as “All S are P,” where S=members of the Tremblay family, and P=wearing a red hat.  Considered from an Aristotelian point of view, however, these two “All S are P” propositions possess a very different logical status.  Aristotle would view the relationship between birds and feathers expressed in the first proposition as a necessary link, for it is of the essence of birds to be feathered.  Something cannot be a bird and lack feathers.  The link between membership in the Tremblay family and the practice of wearing a red hat described in the second proposition is, in sharp contrast, a contingent fact about the world.  A member of the Tremblay family who wore a green hat would still be a member of the Tremblay family.  The fact that the Tremblays only wear red hats (because it is presently the fashion in Quebec) is an accidental (or surface) feature of what a Tremblay is.  So this second relationship holds in a much weaker sense.  In Aristotle’s mind, this has important consequences not just for metaphysics, but for logic.

It is hard to capture in modern English the underlying metaphysical force in Aristotle’s categorical statements.  In the Prior Analytics Aristotle renders the phrase “S is P” as “P belongs to S.”  The sense of belonging here is crucial.  Aristotle wants a logic that tells us what belongs to what.  But there are different levels of belonging.  My billfold belongs to me but this is a very tenuous sort of belonging.  The way my billfold belongs to me pales in significance to, say, the way a bill belongs to a duck-billed platypus.  It is not simply that the bill is physically attached to the platypus.  Even if you were to cut off the bill of a platypus, this would just create a deformed platypus; it would not change the sense of necessary belonging that connects platypuses and bills.  The deep nature of a platypus requires—it necessitates—a bill.  In so much as logic is about discovering necessary relationships, it is not the mere arrangement of terms and symbols but their substantive meaning that is at issue.

As only one consequence of this “metaphysical attitude,” consider Aristotle’s attitude towards inductive generalizations. Aristotle would have no patience for the modern penchant for purely statistical interpretations of inductive generalizations.  It is not the number of times something happens that matters.  It is the deep nature of the thing that counts.  If the wicked boy (or girl) next door pulls three legs off a spider, this is just happenstance.  This five-legged spider does not (for Aristotle) present a serious counterexample to the claim that “all spiders are eight-legged.”  The fact that someone can pull legs off a spider does not change the fact that there is a necessary connection between spiders and having eight legs.  Aristotle is too keen a biologist not to recognize that there are accidents and monstrosities in the world, but the existence of these individual imperfections does not change the deep nature of things.  Aristotle recognizes then that some types of belonging are more substantial—that is, more real—than others.  But this has repercussions for the ways in which we evaluate arguments.  In Aristotle’s mind, the strength of the logical connection that ties a conclusion to the premises in an argument depends, decisively, on the metaphysical status of the claims we are making.  Another example may help.  Suppose I were to argue, first:  “Ostriches are birds; all birds have feathers, therefore, ostriches have feathers.”  Then, second, “Hélène is the youngest daughter of the Tremblay family; all members of the Tremblay family wear red hats; therefore, Hélène wears a red hat.”  These arguments possess the same form.  (We will worry about formal details later.)  But, to Aristotle’s way of thinking, the first argument is, logically, more rigorous than the second.  Its conclusion follows from the essential and therefore necessary features of birds.  In the second argument, the conclusion only follows from the contingent state of fashion in Quebec.  In Aristotelian logic, the strength of an argument depends, in some important way, on metaphysical issues.  We can’t simply say “All S are P; and so forth” and be done with it.  We have to know what “S” and “P” stand for.  This is very different than modern symbolic logic.  Although Aristotle does use letters to take the place of variable terms in a logical relation, we should not be misled into thinking that the substantive content of what is being discussed does not matter.

9. The Syllogism

We are now in a position to consider Aristotle’s theory of the syllogism.  Although one senses that Aristotle took great pride in these accomplishments, we could complain that the persistent focus on the mechanics of the valid syllogism has obscured his larger project.  We will only cover the most basic points here, largely ignoring hypothetical syllogisms, modal syllogisms, extended syllogisms (sorites), inter alia.  The syllogistic now taught in undergraduate philosophy departments represents a later development of Aristotle’s ideas, after they were reworked at the hands of Medieval and modern logicians.  We will begin with a brief account of the way syllogisms are presented in modern logic and then move on to discussion of Aristotle’s somewhat different account.

We can define a syllogism, in relation to its logical form, as an argument made up of three categorical propositions, two premises (which set out the evidence), and a conclusion (that follows logically from the premises).  In the standard account, the propositions are composed of three terms, a subject term, a predicate term, and a middle term: the subject term is the (grammatical) subject of the conclusion; the predicate term modifies the subject in the conclusion, and the middle term links the subject and predicate terms in the premises.  The subject and predicate terms appear in different premises; the middle term appears once in each premise.  The premise with the predicate term and the middle term is called the major premise; the premise with the subject term and the middle term is called the minor premise.  Because syllogisms depend on the precise arrangement of terms, syllogistic logic is sometimes referred to as term logic.  Most readers of this piece are already familiar with some version of a proverbial (non-Aristotelian) example: “All men are mortal; (all) Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle are men; therefore, Socrates, Plato and Aristotle are mortal.”  If we symbolize the three terms in this syllogism such that Middle Term, M=man; Subject Term, S=Socrates, Plato, Aristotle; Predicate Term, P=mortal; we can represent the argument as: Major Premise:  All M is P;  Minor Premise:  All S is M;  Conclusion:  So, All S is P.  In the Middle Ages, scholars came up with Latin names for valid syllogisms, using vowels to represent the position of each categorical proposition.  (Their list is readily available elsewhere.)  The precise arrangement of propositions in this syllogism goes by the Latin moniker “Barbara” because the syllogism is composed of three A propositions: hence, BArbArA: AAA.  A syllogism in Barbara is clearly valid where validity can be understood (in modern terms) as the requirement that if the premises of the argument are true, then the conclusion must be true.  Modern textbook authors generally prove the validity of syllogisms in two ways.  First, they use a number of different rules.  For example: “when major and minor terms are universal in the conclusion they must be universal in the premises”; “if one premise is negative, the conclusion must be negative”; “the middle term in the premises must be distributed (include every member of a class) at least once,” and so on.  Second, they use Venn diagrams, intersecting circles marked to indicate the extension (or range) of different terms, to determine if the information contained in the conclusion is also included in the premises.

Modern logicians, who still hold to traditional conventions, classify syllogisms according to figure and mood.  The four figure classification derives from Aristotle; the mood classification, from Medieval logicians.  One determines the figure of a syllogism by recording the positions the middle term takes in the two premises.  So, for Barbara above, the figure is MP-SM, generally referred to as Figure 1.  One determines the mood of a syllogism by recording the precise arrangement of categorical propositions.  So, for Barbara, the mood is AAA.  By tabulating figures and moods, we can make an inventory of valid syllogisms.  (Medieval philosophers devised a mnemonic poem for such purposes that begins with the line “Barbara, Celarent, Darii, Ferioque priorisis.”  Details can be found in many textbooks.)  Although traditional classroom treatments prefer to stick to this time-honoured approach, Fred Sommers and George Englebretsen have devised a more up-to-date term logic that uses equations with “+” and “−” operators and is more attuned to natural language reasoning than the usual predicate logic.  Turn then to a brief discussion of Aristotle’s own account of the syllogism.

As already mentioned, we need to distinguish between two kinds of necessity.  Aristotle believes in metaphysical or natural necessity.  Birds must have feathers because that is their nature.  So the proposition “All birds have feathers” is necessarily true.”  But Aristotle identifies the syllogistic form with the logical necessity that obtains when two separate propositions necessitate a third.  He defines a sullogismos as “a discourse [logos] in which, certain things being stated, something other than what is stated follows of necessity from them.” (Prior Analytics, I.1.24b18-20, Jenkinson.)  The emphasis here is on the sense of inevitable consequence that precipitates a conclusion when certain forms of propositions are added together.  Indeed, the original Greek term for syllogism is more rigorously translated as “deduction.”  In the Prior Analytics, Aristotle’s method is exploratory.  He searches for pairs of propositions that combine to produce a necessary conclusion.  He begins by accepting that a few syllogisms are self-evidently (or transparently) true.  Barbara, AAA-Fig.1, discussed above, is the best example of this kind of “perfect syllogism.”  Another example of a perfect syllogism is Celarent: EAE-Fig.1.  On seeing the arrangement of terms in such cases, one immediately understands that the conclusion follows necessarily from the premises.  In the case of imperfect syllogisms Aristotle relies on a method of proof that translates them, step-by-step, into perfect syllogisms through a careful rearrangement of terms.  He does this directly, through conversion, or indirectly, through the relationships of contradiction and contrariety outlined in the square of opposition.  To cite only one very simple example, consider a brief passage in the Prior Analytics (I.5.27a5ff) where Aristotle demonstrates that the propositions “No P are M,” and “All S are M” can be combined to produce a syllogism with the conclusion, “No S are P.”  If “No P are M,” it must follow that “No M are P” (conversion); but “No M are P” combined with the second premise, “All S are M” proves that “No S are P.”  (This is to reduce the imperfect syllogism Cesare to the perfect syllogism Celarent.)  This conversion of an imperfect syllogism into a perfect syllogism demonstrates that the original arrangement of terms is a genuine deduction.  In other cases, Aristotle proves that particular arrangements of terms cannot yield proper syllogisms by showing that, in these instances, true premises lead to obviously false or contradictory conclusions.  Alongside these proofs of logical necessity, Aristotle derives general rules for syllogisms, classifies them according to figure, and so on.

It is important to reiterate that Aristotelian syllogisms are not (primarily) about hypothetical sets, imaginary classes, or purely abstract mathematical entities.  Aristotle believes there are natural groups in the world—species and genera—made up of individual members that share a similar nature, and hence similar properties.   It is this sharing of individual things in a similar nature that makes universal statements possible.  Once we have universal terms, we can make over-arching statements that, when combined, lead inescapably to specific results.  In the most rigorous syllogistic, metaphysical necessity is added to logical necessity to produce an unassailable inference.  Seen in this Aristotelian light, syllogisms can be construed as a vehicle for identifying the deep, immutable natures that make things what they are.

Medieval logicians summarized their understanding of the rationale underlying the syllogism in the so-called dictum de omni et nullo (the maxim of all and none), the principle that whatever is affirmed or denied of a whole must be affirmed or denied of a part (which they alleged derived from a reading of Prior Analytics I.1.24b27-30).  Some contemporary authors have claimed that Aristotelian syllogistic is at least compatible with a deflationary theory of truth, the modern idea that truth-claims about propositions amount to little more than an assertion of the statement itself.  (To say that “S is P” is true, is just to assert “S is P.”)  Perhaps it would be better to say that one can trace the modern preoccupation with validity in formal logic to the distinction between issues of logical necessity and propositional truth implicit in Aristotle.  In Aristotle’s logic, arguments do not take the form: “this state of affairs is true/false,” “this state of affairs is true/false,” therefore this state of affairs is true/false.”  We do not argue “All S is M is true” but merely, “All S is M.”  When it comes to determining validity—that is, when it comes to determining whether we have discovered a true syllogism—the question of the truth or falsity of propositions is pushed aside and attention is focused on an evaluation of the logical connection between premises and conclusion.  Obviously, Aristotle recognizes that ascertaining the material truth of premises is an important part of argument evaluation, but he does not present a “truth-functional” logic.  The concept of a “truth value” does not play any explicit role in his formal analysis the way it does, for example, with modern truth tables.  Mostly, Aristotle wants to know what we can confidently conclude from two presumably true premises; that is, what kind of knowledge can be produced or demonstrated if two given premises are true.

10. Inductive Syllogism

Understanding what Aristotle means by inductive syllogism is a matter of serious scholarly dispute.  Although there is only abbreviated textual evidence to go by, his  account of inductive argument can be supplemented by his ampler account of its rhetorical analogues, argument from analogy and argument from example.  What is clear is that Aristotle thinks of induction (epagoge) as a form of reasoning that begins in the sense perception of particulars and ends in a understanding that can be expressed in a universal proposition (or even a concept).  We pick up mental momentum through a familiarity with particular cases that allows us to arrive at a general understanding of an entire species or genus.  As we discuss below, there are indications that Aristotle views induction, in the first instance, as a manifestation of immediate understanding and not as an argument form.  Nonetheless, in the Prior Analytics II.23 (and 24), he casts inductive reasoning in syllogistic form, illustrating the “syllogism that springs out of induction” (ho ex epagoges sullogismos) by an argument about the longevity of bileless animals.

Relying on old biological ideas, Aristotle argues that we can move from observations about the longevity of individual species of bileless animals (that is, animals with clean-blood) to the universal conclusion that bilelessness is a cause of longevity.  His argument can be paraphrased in modern English: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  Although this argument seems, by modern standards, invalid, Aristotle apparently claims that it is a valid deduction.  (Remember that the word “syllogism” means “deduction,” so an “inductive syllogism” is, literally, an “inductive deduction.”)  He uses a technical notion of “convertibility” to formally secure the validity of the argument.  According to this logical rule, terms that cover the same range of cases (because they refer to the same nature) are interchangeable (antistrepho).  They can be substituted for one another.  Aristotle believes that because the logical terms “men, horses, mules, etc” and “bileless animals” refer to the same genus, they are convertible.  If, however, we invert the terms in the proposition “all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals” to “all bileless animals are men, horses, mules, and so forth,” we can then rephrase the original argument: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all bileless animals are men, horses, mules, and so forth; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  This revised induction possesses an obviously valid form (Barbara, discussed above).  Note that Aristotle does not view this inversion of terms as a formal gimmick or trick; he believes that it reflects something metaphysically true about shared natures in the world.  (One could argue that inductive syllogism operates by means of the quantification of the predicate term as well as the subject term of a categorical proposition, but we will not investigate that issue here.)

These passages pose multiple problems of interpretation.  We can only advance a general overview of the most important disagreements here.  We might identify four different interpretations of Aristotle’s account of the inductive syllogism.  (1)  The fact that Aristotle seems to view this as a valid syllogism has led many commentators (such as Ross, McKirahan, Peters) to assume that he is referring to what is known as “perfect induction,” a generalization that is built up from a complete enumeration of particular cases.  The main problem here is that it seems to involve a physical impossibility.  No one could empirically inspect every bileless animal (and/or species) to ascertain that the connection between bilelessness and longevity obtains in every case.  (2) Some commentators combine this first explanation with the further suggestion that the bileless example is a rare case and that Aristotle believes, in line with modern accounts, that most inductions only produce probable belief.  (Cf. Govier’s claim that there is a “tradition going back to Aristotle, which maintains that there are  . . .  only two broad types of argument: deductive arguments which are conclusive, and inductive arguments, which are not.”  (Problems in Argument Analysis, 52.))  One problem with such claims is that they overlook the clear distinction that Aristotle makes between rigorous inductions and rhetorical inductions (which we discuss below).  (3)  Some commentators claim that Aristotle (and the ancients generally) overlooked the inherent tenuousness of the inductive reasoning.  On this account, Empiricists such as Locke and Hume discovered something seriously wrong about induction that escaped the notice of an ancient author like Aristotle.  Philosophers in the modern Anglo-American tradition largely favor this interpretation.  (Cf. Garrett’s and Barbanell’s insistence that “Hume was the first to raise skeptical doubts about inductive reasoning, leaving a puzzle as to why the concerns he highlighted had earlier been so completely overlooked.”  (“Induction,” 172.)  Such allegations do not depend, however, on any close reading of a wealth of relevant passages in the Aristotelian corpus and in ancient philosophy generally.  (4) Finally, a minority contemporary view, growing in prominence, has argued that Aristotle did not conceive of induction as an enumerative process but as a matter of intelligent insight into natures.  (Cf. McCaskey, Biondi, Rijk , Groarke.)  On this account, Aristotle does not mean to suggest that inductive syllogism depends on an empirical inspection of every member of a group but on a universal act of understanding that operates through sense perception.  Aristotelian induction can best be compared to modern notions of abduction or inference to the best explanation.  This non-mathematical account has historical precedents in neo-Platonism, Thomism, Idealism, and in the textbook literature of traditionalist modern logicians that opposed the new formal logic.  This view has been criticized, however, as a form of mere intuitionism dependent on an antiquated metaphysics.

The basic idea that induction is valid will raise eyebrows, no doubt.  It is important to stave off some inevitable criticism before continuing.  Modern accounts of induction, deriving, in large part, from Hume and Locke, display a mania for prediction.  (Hence Hume’s question: how can we know that the future bread we eat will nourish us based on past experience of eating bread?)  But this is not primarily how Aristotle views the problem.  For Aristotle, induction is about understanding natural kinds.  Once we comprehend the nature of something, we will, of course, be able to make predictions about its future properties, but understanding its nature is the key.  In Aristotle’s mind, rigorous induction is valid because it picks out those necessary and essential traits that make something what it is.  To use a very simple example, understanding that all spiders have eight legs—that is, that all undamaged spiders have eight legs—is a matter of knowing something deep about the biological nature that constitutes a spider.  Something that does not have eight legs is not a spider.  (Fruitful analogies might be drawn here to the notion of “a posteriori necessity” countenanced by contemporary logicians such as Hilary Putnam and Saul Kripke or to the “revised” concept of a “natural kind” advanced by authors such as Hilary Kornblith or Brian Ellis.)

It is commonly said that Aristotle sees syllogisms as a device for explaining relationships between groups.  This is, in the main, true.  Still, there has to be some room for a consideration of individuals in logic if we hope to include induction as an essential aspect of reasoning.  As Aristotle explains, induction begins in sense perception and sense perception only has individuals as its object.  Some commentators would limit inductive syllogism to a movement from smaller groups (what Aristotle calls “primitive universals”) to larger groups, but one can only induce a generalization about a smaller group on the basis of a prior observation of individuals that compose that group.  A close reading reveals that Aristotle himself mentions syllogisms dealing with individuals (about the moon, Topics, 78b4ff; about the wall, 78b13ff; about the eclipse, Posterior Analytics, 93a29ff, and so on.)  If we treat individuals as universal terms or as representative of universal classes, this poses no problem for formal analysis.  Collecting observations about one individual or about individuals who belong to a larger group can lead to an accurate generalization.

11. Deduction versus Induction

We cannot fully understand the nature or role of inductive syllogism in Aristotle without situating it with respect to ordinary, “deductive” syllogism.  Aristotle’s distinction between deductive and inductive argument is not precisely equivalent to the modern distinction.  Contemporary authors differentiate between deduction and induction in terms of validity.  (A small group of informal logicians called “Deductivists” dispute this account.)  According a well-worn formula, deductive arguments are valid; inductive arguments are invalid.  The premises in a deductive argument guarantee the truth of the conclusion: if the premises are true, the conclusion must be true.  The premises in an inductive argument provide some degree of support for the conclusion, but it is possible to have true premises and a false conclusion.  Although some commentators attribute such views to Aristotle, this distinction between strict logical necessity and merely probable or plausible reasoning more easily maps onto the distinction Aristotle makes between scientific and rhetorical reasoning (both of which we discuss below).  Aristotle views inductive syllogism as scientific (as opposed to rhetorical) induction and therefore as a more rigorous form of inductive argument.

We can best understand what this amounts to by a careful comparison of a deductive and an inductive syllogism on the same topic.  If we reconstruct, along Aristotelian lines, a deduction on the longevity of bileless animals, the argument would presumably run: All bileless animals are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived.  Defining the terms in this syllogism as: Subject Term, S=men, horses, mules, and so forth; Predicate Term, P=long-lived animals; Middle Term, M=bileless animals, we can represent this metaphysically correct inference as:  Major Premise: All M are P.  Minor Premise: All S are M.  Conclusion: Therefore all S are P.  (Barbara.)  As we already have seen, the corresponding induction runs: All men, horses, mules, and so forth, are long-lived; all men, horses, mules, and so forth, are bileless animals; therefore, all bileless animals are long-lived.  Using the same definition of terms, we are left with:  Major Premise: All S are P.  Minor Premise: All S are M (convertible to All M are S).  Conclusion: Therefore, all M are P.  (Converted to Barbara.)  The difference between these two inferences is the difference between deductive and inductive argument in Aristotle.

Clearly, Aristotelian and modern treatments of these issues diverge.  As we have already indicated, in the modern formalism, one automatically defines subject, predicate, and middle terms of a syllogism according to their placement in the argument.  For Aristotle, the terms in a rigorous syllogism have a metaphysical significance as well.  In our correctly formulated deductive-inductive pair, S represents individual species and/or the individuals that make up those species (men, horses, mules, and so forth); M represents the deep nature of these things (bilelessness), and P represents the property that necessarily attaches to that nature (longevity).  Here then is the fundamental difference between Aristotelian deduction and induction in a nutshell.  In deduction, we prove that a property (P) belongs to individual species (S) because it possesses a certain nature (M); in induction, we prove that a property (P) belongs to a nature (M) because it belongs to individual species (S).  Expressed formally, deduction proves that the subject term (S) is associated with a predicate term (P) by means of the middle term (M); induction proves that the middle term (M) is associated with the predicate term (P) by means of the subject term (S).  (Cf. Prior Analytics, II.23.68b31-35.)  Aristotle does not claim that inductive syllogism is invalid but that the terms in an induction have been rearranged.  In deduction, the middle term joins the two extremes (the subject and predicate terms); in induction, one extreme, the subject term, acts as the middle term, joining the true middle term with the other extreme.  This is what Aristotle means when he maintains that in induction one uses a subject term to argue to a middle term.  Formally, with respect to the arrangement of terms, the subject term becomes the “middle term” in the argument.

Aristotle distinguishes then between induction and deduction in three different ways.  First, induction moves from particulars to a universal, whereas deduction moves from a universal to particulars.  The bileless induction moves from particular species to a universal nature; the bileless deduction moves from a universal nature to particular species.  Second, induction moves from observation to language (that is, from sense perception to propositions), whereas deduction moves from language to language (from propositions to a new proposition).  The bileless induction is really a way of demonstrating how observations of bileless animals lead to (propositional) knowledge about longevity; the bileless deduction demonstrates how (propositional) knowledge of a universal nature leads (propositional) knowledge about particular species. Third, induction identifies or explains a nature, whereas deduction applies or demonstrates a nature.  The bileless induction provides an explanation of the nature of particular species: it is of the nature of bileless organisms to possess a long life.  The bileless deduction applies that finding to particular species; once we know that it is of the nature of bileless organisms to possess a long life, we can demonstrate or put on display the property of longevity as it pertains to particular species.

One final point needs clarification.  The logical form of the inductive syllogism, after the convertibility maneuver, is the same as the deductive syllogism.  In this sense, induction and deduction possess the same (final) logical form.  But, of course, in order to successfully perform an induction, one has to know that convertibility is possible, and this requires an act of intelligence which is able to discern the metaphysical realities between things out in the world.  We discuss this issue under non-discursive reasoning below.

12. Science

Aristotle wants to construct a logic that provides a working language for rigorous science as he understands it.  Whereas we have been talking of syllogisms as arguments, Aristotelian science is about explanation.  Admittedly, informal logicians generally distinguish between explanation and argument.  An argument is intended to persuade about a debatable point; an explanation is not intended to persuade so much as to promote understanding.  Aristotle views science as involving logical inferences that move beyond what is disputable to a consideration of what is the case.  Still, the “explanatory” syllogisms used in science possess precisely the same formal structures as “argumentative” syllogisms.  So we might consider them arguments in a wider sense.  For his part, Aristotle relegates eristic reason to the broad field of rhetoric.  He views science, perhaps naively, as a domain of established fact.  The syllogisms used in science are about establishing an explanation from specific cases (induction) and then applying or illustrating this explanation to specific cases (deduction).

The ancient Greek term for science, “episteme,” is not precisely equivalent to its modern counterpart.  In Aristotle’s worldview, science, as the most rigorous sort of discursive knowledge, is opposed to mere opinion (doxa); it is about what is universal and necessary as opposed to what is particular and contingent, and it is theoretical as opposed to practical.  Aristotle believes that knowledge, understood as justified true belief, is most perfectly expressed in a scientific demonstration (apodeixis), also known as an apodeitic or scientific syllogism.  He posits a number of specific requirements for this most rigorous of all deductions.  In order to qualify as a scientific demonstration, a syllogism must possess premises that are “true, primary, immediate, better known than, prior to, and causative of the conclusion.” (Posterior Analytics, I.2.71b20ff, Tredennick.)  It must yield information about a natural kind or a group of individual things.  And it must produce universal knowledge (episteme).  Specialists have disputed the meaning of these individual requirements, but the main message is clear.  Aristotle accepts, as a general rule, that a conclusion in an argument cannot be more authoritative than the premises that led to that conclusion.  We cannot derive better (or more reliable) knowledge from worse (or less reliable) knowledge.  Given that a scientific demonstration is the most rigorous form of knowledge possible, we must start with premises that are utterly basic and as certain as possible, which are “immediately” induced from observation, and which confirm to the necessary structure of the world in a way that is authoritative and absolutely incontrovertible.  This requires a reliance on first principles which we discuss below.

In the best case scenario, Aristotelian science is about finding definitions of species that, according to a somewhat bald formula, identify the genus (the larger natural group) and the differentia (that unique feature that sets the species apart from the larger group).  As Aristotle’s focus on definitions is a bit cramped and less than consistent (he himself spends a great deal of time talking about necessary rather than essential properties), let us broaden his approach to science to focus on ostensible definitions, where an ostensible definition is either a rigorous definition or, more broadly, any properly-formulated phrase that identifies the unique properties of something.  On this looser approach, which is more consistent with Aristotle’s actual practice, to define an entity is to identify the nature, the essential and necessary properties, that make it uniquely what it is.  Suffice it to say that Aristotle’s idealized account of what science entails needs to be expanded to cover a wide range of activities and that fall under what is now known as scientific practice.  What follows is a general sketch of his overall orientation.  (We should point out that Aristotle himself resorts to whatever informal methods seem appropriate when reporting on his own biological investigations without too much concern for any fixed ideal of formal correctness.  He makes no attempt to cast his own scientific conclusions in metaphysically-correct syllogisms.  One could perhaps insist that he uses enthymemes (syllogisms with unstated premises), but mostly, he just seems to record what seems appropriate without any deliberate attempt at correct formalization.  Note that most of Aristotle’s scientific work is “historia,” an earlier stage of observing, fact-collecting, and opinion-reporting that proceeds the principled theorizing of advanced science.)

For Aristotle, even theology is a science insomuch as it deals with universal and necessary principles.  Still, in line with modern attitudes (and in opposition to Plato), Aristotle views sense-perception as the proper route to scientific knowledge.  Our empirical experience of the world yields knowledge through induction.  Aristotle elaborates then an inductive-deductive model of science.  Through careful observation of  particular species, the scientist induces an ostensible definition to explain a nature and then demonstrates the consequences of that nature for particular species.  Consider a specific case.  In the Posterior Analytics (II.16-17.98b32ff, 99a24ff), Aristotle mentions an explanation about why deciduous plants lose their leaves in the winter.  The ancients apparently believed this happens because sap coagulates at the base of the leaf (which is not entirely off the mark).  We can use this ancient example of a botanical explanation to illustrate how the business of Aristotelian science is supposed to operate.  Suppose we are a group of ancient botanists who discover, through empirical inspection, why deciduous plants such as vines and figs lose their leaves.  Following Aristotle's lead, we can cast our discovery in the form of the following inductive syllogism:  “Vine, fig, and so forth, are deciduous.  Vine, fig, and so forth, coagulate sap.  Therefore, all sap-coagulators are deciduous.”  This induction produces the definition of “deciduous.”  (“Deciduous” is the definiendum; sap-coagulation, the definiens; the point being that everything that is a sap-coagulator is deciduous, which might not be the case if we turned it around and said “All deciduous plants are sap-coagulators.”)  But once we have a definition of “deciduous,” we can use it as the first premise in a deduction to demonstrate something about say, the genus “broad-leaved trees.”  We can apply, in other words, what we have learned about deciduous plants in general to the more specific genus of broad-leaved trees.  Our deduction will read:  “All sap-coagulators are deciduous.  All broad-leaved trees are sap-coagulators.  Therefore, all broad-leaved trees are deciduous.”  We can express all this symbolically.  For the induction, where S=vine, fig, and so forth, P=deciduous, M= being a sap-coagulator, the argument is: “All S is P; all S is M (convertible to all M is S); therefore, all M are P (converted to Barbara).  For the deduction, where S=broad-leafed trees, M=being a sap-coagulator, P=deciduous, the argument can be represented: “All M are P; all S is M; therefore, all S is P” (Barbara).  This is then the basic logic of Aristotelian science.

A simple diagram of how science operates follows (Figure 2).

Figure 2

The Inductive-Deductive Method of Aristotelian Science

Aristotle views science as a search for causes (aitia).  In a well-known example about planets not twinkling because they are close to the earth (Posterior Analytics, I.13), he makes an important distinction between knowledge of the fact and knowledge of the reasoned fact. The rigorous scientist aims at knowledge of the reasoned fact which explains why something is the way it is.  In our example, sap-coagulation is the cause of deciduous; deciduous is not the cause of sap-coagulation.  That is why “sap-coagulation” is featured here as the middle term, because it is the cause of the phenomenon being investigated.  The deduction “All sap-coagulators are deciduous; all broad-leaved trees are sap-coagulators; therefore, all broad-leaved trees are deciduous” counts as knowledge of the reasoned fact because it reveals the cause of broad-leafed deciduousness.

Aristotle makes a further distinction between what is more knowable relative to us and what is more knowable by nature (or in itself).  He remarks in the Physics, “The natural way of [inquiry] is to start from the things which are more knowable and obvious to us and proceed towards those which are clearer and more knowable by nature; for the same things are not ‘knowable relatively to us’ and ‘knowable’ without qualification.”  (I.184a15, Hardie, Gaye.)  In science we generally move from the effect to the cause, from what we see and observe around us to the hidden origins of things.  The outward manifestation of the phenomenon of “deciduousness” is more accessible to us because we can see the trees shedding their leaves, but sap-coagulation as an explanatory principle is more knowable in itself because it embodies the cause.  To know about sap-coagulation counts as an advance in knowledge; someone who knows this knows more than someone who only knows that trees shed their leaves in the fall.  Aristotle believes that the job of science is to put on display what best counts as knowledge, even if the resulting theory strays from our immediate perceptions and first concerns.

Jan Lukasiewicz, a modern-day pioneer in term logic, comments that “some queer philosophical prejudices which cannot be explained rationally” made early commentators claim that the major premise in a syllogism (the one with the middle and predicate terms) must be first.  (Aristotle’s Syllogistic, 32.)  But once we view the syllogism within the larger context of Aristotelian logic, it becomes perfectly obvious why these early commentators put the major premise first: because it constitutes the (ostensible) definition; because it contains an explanation of the nature of the thing upon which everything else depends.  The major premise in a scientific deduction is the most important part of the syllogism; it is scientifically prior in that it reveals the cause that motivates the phenomenon.  So it makes sense to place it first.  This was not an irrational prejudice.

13. Non-Discursive Reasoning

The distinction Aristotle draws between discursive knowledge (that is, knowledge through argument) and non-discursive knowledge (that is, knowledge through nous) is akin to the medieval distinction between ratio (argument) and intellectus (direct intellection).  In Aristotelian logic, non-discursive knowledge comes first and provides the starting points upon which discursive or argumentative knowledge depends.  It is hard to know what to call the mental power that gives rise to this type of knowledge in English.  The traditional term “intuition” invites misunderstanding.  When Aristotle claims that there is an immediate sort of knowledge that comes directly from the mind (nous) without discursive argument, he is not suggesting that knowledge can be accessed through vague feelings or hunches.  He is referring to a capacity for intelligent appraisal that might be better described as discernment, comprehension, or insight.  Like his later medieval followers, he views “intuition” as a species of reason; it is not prior to reason or outside of reason, it is—in the highest degree—the activity of reason itself.  (Cf. Posterior Analytics, II. 19; Nicomachean Ethics, IV.6.)

For Aristotle, science is only one manifestation of human intelligence.  He includes, for example, intuition, craft, philosophical wisdom, and moral decision-making along with science in his account of the five intellectual virtues.  (Nicomachean Ethics, VI.3-8.)  When it comes to knowledge-acquisition, however, intuition is primary.  It includes the most basic operations of intelligence, providing the ultimate ground of understanding and inference upon which everything else depends.  Aristotle is a firm empiricist.  He believes that knowledge begins in perception, but he also believes that we need intuition to make sense of perception.  In the Posterior Analytics (II.19.100a3-10), Aristotle posits a sequence of steps in mental development: sense perception produces memory which (in combination with intuition) produces human experience (empeiria), which produces art and science.  Through a widening movement of understanding (really, a non-discursive form of induction), intuition transforms observation and memory so as to produce knowledge (without argument).  This intuitive knowledge is even more reliable than science.  As Aristotle writes in key passages at the end of the Posterior Analytics, “no other kind of thought except intuition is more accurate than scientific knowledge,” and “nothing except intuition can be truer than scientific knowledge.” (100b8ff, Mure, slightly emended.)

Aristotelian intuition supplies the first principles (archai) of human knowledge: concepts, universal propositions, definitions, the laws of logic, the primary principles of the specialized science, and even moral concepts such as the various virtues.  This is why, according to Aristotle, intuition must be viewed as infallible.  We cannot claim that the first principles of human intelligence are dubious and then turn around and use those principles to make authoritative claims about the possibility (or impossibility) of knowledge.  If we begin to doubt intuition, that is, human intelligence at its most fundamental level of operation, we will have to doubt everything else that is built upon this universal foundation: science, philosophy, knowledge, logic, inference, and so forth.  Aristotle never tries to prove first principles.  He acknowledges that when it comes to the origins of human thought, there is a point when one must simply stop asking questions.  As he points out, any attempt at absolute proof would lead to an infinite regress.  In his own words: “It is impossible that there should be demonstration of absolutely everything; there would be an infinite regress, so that there would still be no demonstration.” (Metaphysics, 1006a6ff, Ross.)  Aristotle does make arguments, for example, that meaningful speech presupposes a logical axiom like the principle of non-contradiction, but that is not, strictly speaking, a proof of the principle.

Needless to say, Aristotle’s reliance on intuition has provoked a good deal of scholarly disagreement.  Contemporary commentators such as Joseph Owens, G. L. Owen, and Terrence Irwin have argued that Aristotelian first principles begin in dialectic.  On their influential account, we arrive at first principles through a weaker form of argument that revolves around a consideration of “endoxa,” the proverbial opinions of the many and/or the wise.  Robin Smith (and others) severely criticize their account.  The idea that mere opinion could somehow give rise to rigorous scientific knowledge conflicts with Aristotle’s settled view that less reliable knowledge cannot provide sufficient logical support for the more reliable knowledge.  As we discuss below, endoxa do provide a starting point for dialectical (and ethical) arguments in Aristotle’s system.  They are, in his mind, a potent intellectual resource, a library of stored wisdom and right opinion.  They may include potent expressions of first principles already discovered by other thinkers and previous generations.  But as Aristotle makes clear at the end of the Posterior Analytics and elsewhere, the recognition that something is a first principle depends directly on intuition.  As he reaffirms in the Nicomachean Ethics, “it is intuitive reason that grasps the first principles.”  (VI.6.1141a7, Ross.)

If Irwin and his colleagues seek to limit the role of intuition in Aristotle, authors such as Lambertus Marie de Rijk and D. W. Hamlyn go to an opposite extreme, denying the importance of the inductive syllogism and identifying induction (epagoge) exclusively with intuition.  De Rijk claims that Aristotelian induction is “a pre-argumentation procedure consisting in . . . [a] disclosure [that] does not take place by a formal, discursive inference, but is, as it were, jumped upon by an intuitive act of knowledge.” (Semantics and Ontology, I.2.53, 141-2.) Although this position seems extreme, it seems indisputable that inductive syllogism depends on intuition, for without intuition (understood as intelligent discernment), one could not recognize the convertibility of subject and middle terms (discussed above).  Aristotle also points out that one needs intuition to recognize the (ostensible) definitions so crucial to the practice of Aristotelian science.  We must be able to discern the difference between accidental and necessary or essential properties before coming up with a definition.  This can only come about through some kind of direct (non-discursive) discernment.  Aristotle proposes a method for discovering definitions called division—we are to divide things into smaller and smaller sub-groups—but this method depends wholly on nous.  (Cf. Posterior Analytics, II.13.)  Some modern Empiricist commentators, embarrassed by such mystical-sounding doctrines, warn that this emphasis on non-discursive reasoning collapses into pure rationalism (or Platonism), but this is a caricature.  What Aristotle means by rational “intuition” is not a matter of pure, disembodied thought.  One does not arrive at first principles by closing one’s eyes and retreating from the world (as with Cartesian introspection).  For Aristotle, first principles arise through a vigorous interaction of the empirical with the rational; a combination of rationality and sense experience produces the first seeds of human understanding.

Note that Aristotle believes that there are first principles (koinai archai) that are common to all fields of inquiry, such as the principle of non-contradiction or the law of excluded middle, and that each specialized science has its own first principles.  We may recover these first principles second-hand by a (dialectical) review of authorities.  Or, we can derive them first hand by analysis, by dividing the subject matter we are concerned with into its constituent parts.  At the beginning of the Physics, Aristotle explains, “What is to us plain and obvious at first is rather confused masses, the elements and principles of which become known to us later by analysis. Thus we must advance from generalities to particulars; for it is a whole that is best known to sense-perception, and a generality is a kind of whole, comprehending many things within it, like parts.  . . .  Similarly a child begins by calling all men ‘father,’ and all women ‘mother,’ but later on distinguishes each of them.”  (I.1.184a22-184b14, Hardie, Gaye.)  Just as children learn to distinguish their parents from other human beings, those who successfully study a science learn to distinguish the different natural kinds that make up the whole of a scientific phenomenon.  This precedes the work of induction and deduction already discussed. Once we have the parts (or the aspects), we can reason about them scientifically.

14. Rhetoric

Argumentation theorists (less aptly characterized as informal logicians) have critiqued the ascendancy of formal logic, complaining that the contemporary penchant for symbolic logic leaves one with an abstract mathematics of empty signs that cannot be applied in any useful way to larger issues.  Proponents of formal logic counter that their specialized formalism allows for a degree of precision otherwise not available and that any focus on the substantive meaning or truth of propositions is a distraction from logical issues per se.  We cannot readily fit Aristotle into one camp or the other.  Although he does provide a formal analysis of the syllogism, he intends logic primarily as a means of acquiring true statements about the world.  He also engages in an enthusiastic investigation of less rigorous forms of reasoning included in the study of dialectic and rhetoric.

Understanding precisely what Aristotle means by the term “dialectics” (dialektike) is no easy task.  He seems to view it as the technical study of argument in general or perhaps as a more specialized investigation into argumentative dialogue.  He intends his rhetoric (rhetorike), which he describes as the counterpart to dialectic, as an expansive study of the art of persuasion, particularly as it is directed towards a non-academic public.  Suffice it to say, for our purposes, that Aristotle reserves a place in his logic for a general examination of all arguments, for scientific reasoning, for rhetoric, for debating techniques of various sorts, for jurisprudential pleading, for cross-examination, for moral reasoning, for analysis, and for non-discursive intuition.

Aristotle distinguishes between what I will call, for convenience, rigorous logic and persuasive logic.  Rigorous logic aims at epistē, true belief about what is eternal, necessary, universal, and unchanging.  (Aristotle sometimes qualifies this to include “for the most part” scientific knowledge.)  Persuasive logic aims at acceptable, probable, or convincing belief (what we might call “opinion” instead of knowledge.)  It deals with approximate truth, with endoxa (popular or proverbial opinions), with reasoning that is acceptable to a particular audience, or with claims about accidental properties and contingent events.  Persuasive syllogisms have the same form as rigorous syllogisms but are understood as establishing their conclusions in a weaker manner.  As we have already seen, rigorous logic produces deductive and inductive syllogisms; Aristotle indicates that persuasive logic produces, in a parallel manner, enthymemes, analogies, and examples.  He defines an enthymeme as a deduction “concerned with things which may, generally speaking, be other than they are,” with matters that are “for the most part only generally true,”  or with “probabilities and signs”  (Rhetoric, I.2.1357a, Roberts).  He also mentions that the term “enthymeme” may refer to arguments with missing premises.  (Rhetoric, 1.2.1357a16-22.)  When it comes to induction, Aristotle’s presentation is more complicated, but we can reconstruct what he means in a more straightforward manner.

The persuasive counterpart to the inductive syllogism is the analogy and the example, but the example is really a composite argument formed from first, an analogy and second, an enthymeme.  Some initial confusion is to be expected as Aristotle’s understanding of analogies differs somewhat from contemporary accounts.  In contemporary treatments, analogies depend on a direct object(s)-to-object(s) comparison.  Aristotelian analogy, on the other hand, involves reasoning up to a general principle.  We are to conclude (1) that because individual things of a certain nature X have property z, everything that possesses nature X has property z.  But once we know that every X possesses property z, we can make a deduction (2) that some new example of nature X will also have property z.  Aristotle calls (1), the inductive movement up to the generalization, an analogy (literally, an argument from likeness=ton homoion); he calls (2), the deductive movement down to a new case, an enthymeme; and he considers (1) + (2), the combination of the analogy and the enthymeme together, an example (paradeigma).  He presents the following argument from example in the Rhetoric (I.2.1357b31-1358a1).  Suppose we wish to argue that Dionysus, the ruler, is asking for a bodyguard in order to set himself up as despot.  We can establish this by a two-step process.  First, we can draw a damning analogy between previous cases where rulers asked for a bodyguard and induce a general rule about such practices.  We can insist that Peisistratus, Theagenes, and other known tyrants, were scheming to make themselves despots, that Peisistratus, Theagenes, and other known tyrants also asked for a bodyguard, and that therefore, everyone who asks for a bodyguard is scheming to make themselves dictators.  But once we have established this general rule, we can move on to the second step in our argument, using this conclusion as a premise in an enthymeme.  We can argue that all people asking for a bodyguard are scheming to make themselves despots, that Dionysius is someone asking for a bodyguard, and that therefore, Dionysius must be scheming to make himself despot.  This is not, in Aristotle’s mind, rigorous reasoning.  Nonetheless, we can, in this way, induce probable conclusions and then use them to deduce probable consequences.  Although these arguments are intended to be persuasive or plausible rather than scientific, but the reasoning strategy mimics the inductive-deductive movement of science (without compelling, of course, the same degree of belief).

We should point out that Aristotle does not restrict himself to a consideration of purely formal issues in his discussion of rhetoric.  He famously distinguishes, for example, between three means of persuasion: ethos, pathos, and logos.  As we read, at the beginning of his Rhetoric: “Of the modes of persuasion furnished by the spoken word there are three kinds. . . . [Firstly,] persuasion is achieved by the speaker's personal character when the speech is so spoken as to make us think him credible. . . . Secondly, persuasion may come through the hearers, when the speech stirs their emotions. . . . Thirdly, persuasion is effected through the speech itself when we have proved [the point] by means of the persuasive arguments suitable to the case in question.”  (Rhetoric, I.2.1356a2-21, Roberts.)  Aristotle concludes that effective arguers must (1) understand morality and be able to convince an audience that they themselves are good, trustworthy people worth listening to (ethos); (2) know the general causes of emotion and be able to elicit them from specific audience (pathos); and (3) be able to use logical techniques to make convincing (not necessarily sound) arguments (logos).  Aristotle broaches many other issues we cannot enter into here.  He acknowledges that the goal of rhetoric is persuasion, not truth.  Such techniques may be bent to immoral or dishonest ends.  Nonetheless, he insists that it is in the public interest to provide a comprehensive and systematic survey of the field.

We might mention two other logical devices that have a place in Aristotle’s work: the topos and the aporia.  Unfortunately, Aristotle never explicitly explains what a topos is.  The English word “topic” does not do justice to the original notion, for although Aristotelian topoi may be organized around subject matter, they focus more precisely on recommended strategies for successful arguing.  (The technical term derives from a Greek word referring to a physical location.  Some scholars suggest a link to ancient mnemonic techniques that superimposed lists on familiar physical locations as a memory aid.)  In relevant discussions (in the Topics and the Rhetoric) Aristotle offers helpful advice about finding (or remembering) suitable premises, about verbally out-manoeuvring an opponent, about finding forceful analogies, and so on.  Examples of specific topoi would include discussions about how to argue which is the better of two alternatives, how to substitute terms effectively, how to address issues about genus and property, how to argue about cause and effect, how to conceive of sameness and difference, and so on.  Some commentators suggest that different topoi may have been used in a classroom situation in conjunction with student exercises and standardized texts, or with written lists of endoxa, or even with ready-made arguments that students were expected to memorize.

An aporia is a common device in Greek philosophy.  The Greek word aporia (plural, aporiai) refers to a physical location blocked off by obstacles where there is no way out; by extension, it means, in philosophy, a mental perplexity, an impasse, a paradox or puzzle that stoutly resists solution.  Aristotle famously suggests that philosophers begin with aporiai and complete their task by resolving the apparent paradoxes.  An attentive reader will uncover many aporiai in Aristotle who begins many of his treatises with a diaporia, a survey of the puzzles that occupied previous thinkers.  Note that aporiai cannot be solved through some mechanical rearrangement of symbolic terms.  Solving puzzles requires intelligence and discernment; it requires some creative insight into what is at stake.

15. Fallacies

In a short work entitled Sophistical Refutations, Aristotle introduces a theory of logical fallacies that has been remarkably influential.  His treatment is abbreviated and somewhat obscure, and there is inevitably scholarly disagreement about precise exegesis.  Aristotle thinks of fallacies as instances of specious reasoning; they are not merely errors but hidden errors.  A fallacy is an incorrect reasoning strategy that gives the illusion of being sound or somehow conceals the underlying problem.  Aristotle divides fallacies into two broad categories: those which depend on language (sometimes called verbal fallacies) and those that are independent of language (sometimes called material fallacies).  There is some scholarly disagreement about particular fallacies, but traditional English names and familiar descriptions follow.  Linguistic fallacies include: homonymy (verbal equivocation), ambiguity (amphiboly or grammatical equivocation), composition (confusing parts with a whole), division (confusing a whole with parts), accent (equivocation that arises out of mispronunciation or misplaced emphasis) and figure of speech (ambiguity resulting from the form of an expression).  Independent fallacies include accident (overlooking exceptions), converse accident (hasty generalization or improper qualification), irrelevant conclusion, affirming the consequent (assuming an effect guarantees the presence of one possible cause), begging the question (assuming the point), false cause, and complex question (disguising two or more questions as one).  Logicians, influenced by scholastic logic, often gave these characteristic mistakes Latin names: compositio for composition, divisio for division, secundum quid et simpliciter for converse accident, ignoranti enlenchi for nonrelevant conclusion, and petitio principii for begging the question.

Consider three brief examples of fallacies from Aristotle’s original text.  Aristotle formulates the following amphiboly (which admittedly sounds awkward in English): “I wish that you the enemy may capture.”  (Sophistical Refutations, 4.166a7-8, Pickard-Cambridge.)  Clearly, the grammatical structure of the statement leaves it ambiguous as to whether the speaker is hoping that the enemy or “you” be captured.  In discussing complex question, he supplies the following perplexing example: “Ought one to obey the wise or one’s father?”  (Ibid., 12.173a21.)  Obviously, from a Greek perspective, one ought to obey both.  The problem is that the question has been worded in such a way that anyone who answers will be forced to reject one moral duty in order to embrace the other.  In fact, there are two separate questions here—Should one obey the wise?  Should one obey one’s father?—that have been illegitimately combined to produce a single question with a single answer.  Finally, Aristotle provides the following time-honoured example of affirming the consequent: “Since after the rain the ground is wet, we suppose that if the ground is wet, it has been raining; whereas that does not necessarily follow”  (Ibid., 5.167b5-8.)  Aristotle’s point is that assuming that the same effect never has more than one cause misconstrues the true nature of the world.  The same effect may have several causes.  Many of Aristotle’s examples have to do with verbal tricks which are entirely unconvincing—for example, the person who commits the fallacy of division by arguing that the number “5” is both even and odd because it can be divided into an even and an odd number: “2” and “3.”  (Ibid., 4.166a32-33.)  But the interest here is theoretical: figuring out where an obviously-incorrect argument or proposition went wrong.  We should note that much of this text, which deals with natural language argumentation, does not presuppose the syllogistic form.  Aristotle does spend a good bit of time considering how fallacies are related to one another.  Fallacy theory, it is worth adding, is a thriving area of research in contemporary argumentation theory.  Some of these issues are hotly debated.

16. Moral Reasoning

In the modern world, many philosophers have argued that morality is a matter of feelings, not reason.  Although Aristotle recognizes the connative (or emotional) side of morality, he takes a decidedly different tack.  As a virtue ethicist, he does not focus on moral law but views morality through the lens of character.  An ethical person develops a capacity for habitual decision-making that aims at good, reliable traits such as honesty, generosity, high-mindedness, and courage.  To modern ears, this may not sound like reason-at-work, but Aristotle argues that only human beings—that is, rational animals—are able to tell the difference between right and wrong.  He widens his account of rationality to include a notion of practical wisdom (phronesis), which he defines as “a true and reasoned state of capacity to act with regard to the things that are good or bad for man.”  (Nicomachean Ethics, VI.5.1140b4-5, Ross, Urmson).  The operation of practical wisdom, which is more about doing than thinking, displays an inductive-deductive pattern similar to science as represented in Figure 3.  It depends crucially on intuition or nous.  One induces the idea of specific virtues (largely, through an exercise of non-discursive reason) and then deduces how to apply these ideas to particular circumstances.  (Some scholars make a strict distinction between “virtue” (areté) understood as the mental capacity which induces moral ideas and “phronesis” understood as the mental capacity which applies these ideas, but the basic structure of moral thinking remains the same however strictly or loosely we define these two terms.)

Figure 3

The Inductive-Deductive Method of Aristotelian Ethics

We can distinguish then between moral induction and moral deduction.  In moral induction, we induce an idea of courage, honesty, loyalty, and so on.  We do this over time, beginning in our childhood, through habit and upbringing.  Aristotle writes that the successful moral agent “must be born with an eye, as it were, by which to judge rightly and choose what is truly good.”  (Ibid., VI.7.1114b6ff.)  Once this intuitive capacity for moral discernment has been sufficiently developed—once the moral eye is able to see the difference between right and wrong,—we can apply moral norms to the concrete circumstances of our own lives.  In moral deduction, we go on to apply the idea of a specific virtue to a particular situation.  We do not do this by formulating moral arguments inside our heads, but by making reasonable decisions, by doing what is morally required given the circumstances.  Aristotle refers, in this connection, to the practical syllogism which results “in a conclusion which is an action.” (Movement of Animals, 701a10ff, Farquharson.)  Consider a (somewhat simplified) example.   Suppose I induce the idea of promise-keeping as a virtue and then apply it to question of whether I should pay back the money I borrowed from my brother.  The corresponding theoretical syllogism would be:  Promise-keeping is good; giving back the money I owe my brother is an instance of promise-keeping; so giving the back the money I owe my brother is good.”  In the corresponding practical syllogism, I do not conclude with a statement:  “this act is good.”  I go out and pay back the money I owe my brother.  The physical exchange of money counts as the conclusion.  In Aristotle’s moral system, general moral principles play the role of an ostensible definition in science.  One induces a general principle and deduces a corresponding action.  Aristotle does believe that moral reasoning is a less rigorous form of reasoning than science, but chiefly because scientific demonstrations deal with universals whereas the practical syllogism ends a single act that must be fitted to contingent circumstances.  There is never any suggestion that morality is somehow arbitrary or subjective.  One could set out the moral reasoning process using the moral equivalent of an inductive syllogism and a scientific demonstration.

Although Aristotle provides a logical blueprint for the kind of reasoning that is going on in ethical decision-making, he obviously does not view moral decision-making as any kind of mechanical or algorithmic procedure.  Moral induction and deduction represent, in simplified form, what is going on.  Throughout his ethics, Aristotle emphasizes the importance of context.  The practice of morality depends then on a faculty of keen discernment that notices, distinguishes, analyzes, appreciates, generalizes, evaluates, and ultimately decides.  In the Nicomachean Ethics, he includes practical wisdom in his list of five intellectual virtues.  (Scholarly commentators variously explicate the relationship between the moral and the intellectual virtues.)  Aristotle also discusses minor moral virtues such as good deliberation (eubulia), theoretical moral understanding (sunesis), and experienced moral judgement (gnome).  And he equates moral failure with chronic ignorance or, in the case of weakness of will (akrasia), with intermittent ignorance.

17. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Complete Works of Aristotle.  Edited by Jonathan Barnes.  Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1984.
    • The standard scholarly collection of translations.
  • Aristotle in 23 Volumes.  Cambridge, M.A.: Harvard University Press; London: William Heinemann Ltd., 1944 and 1960.
    • A scholarly, bilingual edition.

b. Secondary Sources

This list is intended as a window on a diversity of approaches and problems.

  • Barnes, Jonathan, (Aristotle) Posterior Analytics. Oxford: Clarendon Press; New York : Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Biondi, Paolo.  Aristotle: Posterior Analytics II.19.  Quebec, Q.C.: Les Presses de l’Universite Laval, 2004.
  • Ebbesen, Sten, Commentators and Commentaries on Aristotle’s Sophistici Elenchi, Vol. 1: The Greek Tradition. Leiden: Brill, 1981.
  • Engberg-Pedersen, Troels.  “More on Aristotelian Epagoge.” Phronesis, 24 (1979): 301-319.
  • Englebretsen, George.  Three Logicians: Aristotle, Leibnitz, and Sommers and the Syllogistic.  Assen, Netherlands: Van Gorcum, 1981.
    • See also Sommers, below.
  • Garrett, Dan, and Edward Barbanell.  Encyclopedia of Empiricism. Westport, Conn.: Greenwood Press, 1997.
  • Govier, Trudy.  Problems in Argument Analysis and Evaluation.  Providence, R.I.: Floris, 1987.
  • Groarke, Louis. “A Deductive Account of Induction,” Science et Esprit, 52 (December 2000), 353-369.
  • Groarke, Louis. An Aristotelian Account of Induction: Creating Something From Nothing.  Montreal & Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press, 2009.
  • Hamlyn, D. W.  Aristotle’s De Anima Books II and III.  Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1974.
  • Hamlyn, D. W. “Aristotelian Epagoge.”  Phronesis 21 (1976): 167-184.
  • Irwin, Terence.  Aristotle’s First Principles.  Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1988.
  • Keyt, David.  “Deductive Logic,” in A Companion to Aristotle, George Anaganostopoulos, London: Blackwell, 2009, pp. 31-50.
  • Łukasiewicz, Jan.  Aristotle's Syllogistic from the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic. Oxford University Press, 1957.
  • McCaskey, John, “Freeing Aristotelian Epagôgê from Prior Analytics II 23,” Apeiron, 40:4 (December, 2007), pp. 345–74.
  • McKirahan, Richard Jr.  Principles and Proofs: Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstrative Species.  Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Parry, William, and Edward Hacker. Aristotelian Logic. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Peters, F. E., Greek Philosophical Terms: A Historical Lexicon.  New York: NYU Press, 1967.
  • Rijk, Lambertus Marie de.  Aristotle: Semantics and Ontology.  Boston, M.A.: Brill, 2002.
  • Smith, Robin.  “Aristotle on the Uses of Dialectic,” Synthese , Vol. 96, No. 3, 1993, 335-358.
  • Smith, Robin. Aristotle, Prior Analytics.  Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1989.
  • Smith, Robin. “Aristotle’s Logic,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. E, Zalta. ed. Stanford, CA., 2000, 2007.
    • An excellent introduction to Aristotle’s logic (with a different focus).
  • Smith, Robin. “Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstration,” in A Companion to Aristotle, 52-65.
  • Sommers, Fred, and George Englebretsen, An Invitation to Formal Reasoning: The Logic of Terms. Aldershot UK: Ashgate, 2000.


Author Information

Louis F. Groarke
St. Francis Xavier University

Thrasymachus (fl. 427 B.C.E.)

Thrasymachus of Chalcedon is one of several "older sophists" (including Antiphon, Critias, Hippias, Gorgias, and Protagoras) who became famous in Athens during the fifth century B.C.E. We know that Thrasymachus was born in Chalcedon, a colony of Megara in Bithynia, and that he had distinguished himself as a teacher of rhetoric and speechwriter in Athens by the year 427. Beyond this, relatively little is known about his life and works. Thrasymachus' lasting importance is due to his memorable place in the first book of Plato's Republic. Although it is not quite clear whether the views Plato attributes to Thrasymachus are indeed the views the historical person held, Thrasymachus' critique of justice has been of considerable importance, and seems to represent moral and political views that are representative of the Sophistic Enlightenment in late fifth century Athens.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Sources
  2. Doctrines
  3. Influence
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Sources

The precise years of Thrasymachus' birth and death are hard to determine. According to Dionysius, he is younger than Lysias, who Dionysius falsely believed to be born in 459 B.C.E. Aristotle places him between Tisias and Theodorus, but he does not list any precise dates. Cicero mentions Thrasymachus several times in connection with Gorgias and seems to imply that Gorgias and Thrasymachus were contemporaries. A precise reference date for Thrasymachus' life is provided by Aristophanes, who makes fun of him in his first play Banqueters. That play was performed in 427, and we can conclude therefore that he must have been teaching in Athens for several years before that. One of the surviving fragments of Thrasymachus' writing (Diels-Kranz Numbering System 85b2) contains a reference to Archelaos, who was King of Macedonia from 413-399 B.C.E. We thus can conclude that Thrasymachus was most active during the last three decades of the fifth century.

2. Doctrines

The remaining fragments of Thrasymachus' writings provide few clues about his philosophical ideas. They either deal with rhetorical issues or they are excerpts from speeches (DK 85b1 and b2) that were (probably) written for others and thus can hardly be seen as the expression of Thrasymachus' own thoughts. The most interesting fragment is DK 85b8. It contains the claim that the gods do not care about human affairs since they do not seem to enforce justice. Scholars have, however, been divided whether this claim is compatible with the position Plato attributes to Thrasymachus in the first book of the Republic. Plato's account there is by far the most detailed, though perhaps historically suspect, evidence for Thrasymachus' philosophical ideas.

In the first book of the Republic, Thrasymachus attacks Socrates' position that justice is an important good. He claims that 'injustice, if it is on a large enough scale, is stronger, freer, and more masterly than justice' (344c). In the course of arguing for this conclusion, Thrasymachus makes three central claims about justice.

  1. Justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger (338c)
  2. Justice is obedience to laws (339b)
  3. Justice is nothing but the advantage of another (343c).

There is an obvious tension among these three claims. It is far from clear why somebody who follows legal regulations must always do what is in the interest of the (politically) stronger, or why these actions must serve the interests of others. Scholars have tried to resolve these tensions by emphasizing one of the three claims at the expense of the other two.

First, there are those scholars (Wilamowitz 1920, Zeller 1889, and Strauss 1952) who take (1) as the central element of Thrasymachus' thinking about justice. According to this view, Thrasymachus is an advocate of natural right who claims that it is just (by nature) that the strong rule over the weak. This interpretation stresses the similarities between Thrasymachus' arguments and the position Plato attributes to Callicles in the Gorgias.

A second group of scholars (Hourani 1962, and Grote 1850) emphasizes the importance of (2) and contends that Thrasymachus advocates a form of legalism. According to this interpretation, Thrasymachus is a relativist who denies that justice is anything beyond obedience to existing laws.

A third group (Kerferd 1947, Nicholson 1972) argues that (3) is the central element in Thrasymachus' thinking about justice. Thrasymachus therefore turns out to be an ethical egoist who stresses that justice is the good of another and thus incompatible with the pursuit of one's self-interest. Scholars in this group view Thrasymachus primarily as an ethical thinker and not as a political theorist.

In addition, there is a group of scholars (A.E. Taylor 1960, and Burnet 1964) who read Thrasymachus as an ethical nihilist. According to this view, Thrasymachus' project is to show that justice does not exist. Burnet writes in this context: '[Thrasymachus] is the real ethical counterpart to the cosmological nihilism of Gorgias.'

Others (Barney 2004 and Johnson 2005) have stressed that Thrasymachus should not be read as a philosopher who offers precise definitions of justice, but rather as a sociologist or political scientist who offers empirical observations that amount to a cynical commentary on those who follow a traditional, Hesiodic conception of justice.

Finally, there are a number of scholars who claim that Thrasymachus is a confused thinker. Cross and Woozley (1964) contend, for example, that Thrasymachus advances different criteria for justice 'without appreciating that they do not necessarily coincide.' This claim has been renewed by Everson (1998). J.P. Maguire (1971) argues that only some of the arguments in book I of the Republic are Thrasymachus' own, while other ideas are falsely attributed to Thrasymachus by Plato in order to prepare the ground for his own arguments.

3. Influence

In spite of the disagreement about how to interpret Thrasymachus' arguments in book I of the Republic, his ideas have been influential in ethical and political theory. In ethics, Thrasymachus' ideas have often been seen as the first fundamental critique of moral values. Thrasymachus' insistence that justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger seems to support the view that moral values are socially constructed and are nothing but the reflection of the interests of particular political communities. Thrasymachus can thus be read as a foreshadowing of Nietzsche, who argues as well that moral values need to be understood as socially constructed entities. In political theory, Thrasymachus has often been seen as a spokesperson for a cynical realism that contends that might makes right. This view frequently associates Thrasymachus with the arguments Thucydides attributes to the Athenians in their negotiations with the island of Melos (History of the Peloponnesian War, Chapter XVII). Thrasymachus is therefore frequently portrayed as an early version of Machiavelli who argues in The Prince that the true statesman does not recognize any moral constrains in his pursuit of power. In the scholarship on Socrates, Thrasymachus is sometimes seen as an interlocutor who shows the limits of the Socratic elenchus. C.D.C. Reeve (1988) argues, for instance, that the conversation between Socrates and Thrasymachus illustrates that Socratic questioning cannot benefit a person like Thrasymachus, who categorically denies that justice is a virtue. Reeve contends that this limit of the elenctic method provided the impetus why Plato proceeded to modify Socrates' ethical principles in the remaining books of the Republic.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Diels, Hermann. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Rev. Walther Kranz. Berlin: Weidmann, 1972-1973.
  • Plato. Republic. Trans. G.M.A. Grube (rev. C.D.C. Reeve). Indianapolis: Hackett, 1992.
  • The Older Sophists: A Complete Translation by Several Hands. Columbia SC: University of South Carolina Press, 1972.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Adkins, A.W.H.Merit and Responsibility: A Study in Greek Values Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1960.
  • Balot, R.K.Greed and Injustice in Classical Athens Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2001.
  • Barney, R."Callicles and Thrasymachus"Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
  • Burnet, J. Greek Philosophy. London: Macmillian, 1964.
  • Chapell,T.D.J. "The Virtues of Thrasymachus" Phronesis 38 (1993): 1-17
  • Chapell,T.D.J. "Thrasymachus and Definition" Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 18 (2000): 101-107
  • Everson, S. "The Incoherence of Thrasymachus" Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 16 (1998): 99-131.
  • Cross, R.C. and Woozley, A.D. Plato's Republic. A Philosophical Commentary. London: Macmillian, 1964.
  • Grote, G. A History of Greece. London: J. Murnay, 1888.
  • Hourani, C.F. "Thrasymachus' Definition of Justice in Plato's Republic" Phronesis 7 (1962): 110-120.
  • Johnson, C.Socrates and the Immoralists Lanham: Lexington Books, 2005
  • Kerferd, G.B. "The doctrine of Thrasymachus in Plato's Republic" Durham Univ. Journal 40 (1947): 19-27.
  • Kerferd, G. B. The Sophistic Movement. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Maguire, J.P. "Thrasymachus...or Plato?" Phronesis 16 (1971):142-163.
  • Nicholson, P.P. "Unravelling Thrasymachus' Argument in the Republic" Phronesis 19 (1974): 210-232.
  • O'Neill, B. "The Struggle for the Soul of Thrasymachus"Ancient Philosophy 8 (1988):167-85.
  • Reeve, C.D.C. "Socrates meets Thrasymachus" Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 67 (1985): 246-265.
  • Reeve, C.D.C. Philosopher-Kings. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
  • Strauss, L. Natural Right and History. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1952.
  • Taylor, A.E. Plato, the Man and his Work. London: Methenn, 1960.
  • White, S.A."Thrasymachus the Diplomat"Classical Philology 90 (1995): 307-27.
  • Willamowitz-Moellendorff, U.v. Platon I. Berlin: Weidmann, 1920.
  • Zeller, E. Outlines of the History of Greek Philosophy. New York: H.Holt, 1889.

Author Information

Nils Rauhut
Coastal Carolina University
U. S. A.

Plato: Phaedo

The Phaedo is one of the most widely read dialogues written by the ancient Greek philosopher Plato.  It claims to recount the events and conversations that occurred on the day that Plato’s teacher, Socrates (469-399 B.C.E.), was put to death by the state of Athens.  It is the final episode in the series of dialogues recounting Socrates’ trial and death.  The earlier Euthyphro dialogue portrayed Socrates in discussion outside the court where he was to be prosecuted on charges of impiety and corrupting the youth; the Apology described his defense before the Athenian jury; and the Crito described a conversation during his subsequent imprisonment.  The Phaedo now brings things to a close by describing the moments in the prison cell leading up to Socrates’ death from poisoning by use of hemlock.

Among these “trial and death” dialogues, the Phaedo is unique in that it presents Plato’s own metaphysical, psychological, and epistemological views; thus it belongs to Plato’s middle period rather than with his earlier works detailing Socrates’ conversations regarding ethics.  Known to ancient commentators by the title On the Soul, the dialogue presents no less than four arguments for the soul’s immortality.  It also contains discussions of Plato’s doctrine of knowledge as recollection, his account of the soul’s relationship to the body, and his views about causality and scientific explanation.  Most importantly of all, Plato sets forth his most distinctive philosophical theory—the theory of Forms—for what is arguably the first time. So, the Phaedo merges Plato’s own philosophical worldview with an enduring portrait of Socrates in the hours leading up to his death.

Table of Contents

  1. The Place of the Phaedo within Plato’s works
  2. Drama and Doctrine
  3. Outline of the Dialogue
    1. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)
    2. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)
      1. The Cyclical Argument (70c-72e)
      2. The Argument from Recollection (72e-78b)
      3. The Affinity Argument (78b-84b)
    3. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)
      1. The Objections (85c-88c)
      2. Interlude on Misology (89b-91c)
      3. Response to Simmias (91e-95a)
      4. Response to Cebes (95a-107b)
        1. Socrates’ Intellectual History (96a-102a)
        2. The Final Argument (102b-107b)
    4. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)
    5. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. General Commentaries
    2. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)
    3. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)
    4. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)
    5. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)
    6. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

1. The Place of the Phaedo within Plato’s works

Plato wrote approximately thirty dialogues.  The Phaedo is usually placed at the beginning of his “middle” period, which contains his own distinctive views about the nature of knowledge, reality, and the soul, as well as the implications of these views for human ethical and political life.  Its middle-period classification puts it after “early” dialogues such as the Apology, Euthyphro, Crito, Protagoras, and others which present Socrates’ search—usually inconclusive—for ethical definitions, and before “late” dialogues like the Parmenides, Theaetetus, Sophist, and Statesman.  Within the middle dialogues, it is uncontroversial that the Phaedo was written before the Republic, and most scholars think it belongs before the Symposium as well.  Thus, in addition to being an account of what Socrates said and did on the day he died, the Phaedo contains what is probably Plato’s first overall statement of his own philosophy.  His most famous theory, the theory of Forms, is presented in four different places in the dialogue.

2. Drama and Doctrine

In addition to its central role in conveying Plato’s philosophy, the Phaedo is widely agreed to be a masterpiece of ancient Greek literature. Besides philosophical argumentation, it contains a narrative framing device that resembles the chorus in Greek tragedy, references to the Greek myth of Theseus and the fables of Aesop, Plato’s own original myth about the afterlife, and in its opening and closing pages, a moving portrait of Socrates in the hours leading up to his death.  Plato draws attention (at 59b) to the fact that he himself was not present during the events retold, suggesting that he wants the dialogue to be seen as work of fiction.

Contemporary commentators have struggled to put together the dialogue’s dramatic components with its lengthy sections of philosophical argumentation—most importantly, with the four arguments for the soul’s immortality, which tend to strike even Plato’s charitable interpreters as being in need of further defense.  (Socrates himself challenges his listeners to provide such defense at 84c-d.)  How seriously does Plato take these arguments, and what does the surrounding context contribute to our understanding of them?  While this article will concentrate on the philosophical aspects of the Phaedo, readers are advised to pay close attention to the interwoven dramatic features as well.

3. Outline of the Dialogue

The dialogue revolves around the topic of death and immortality: how the philosopher is supposed to relate to death, and what we can expect to happen to our souls after we die.  The text can be divided, rather unevenly, into five sections:

(1) an initial discussion of the philosopher and death (59c-69e)

(2) three arguments for the soul’s immortality (69e-84b)

(3) some objections to these arguments from Socrates’ interlocutors and his response, which includes a fourth argument (84c-107b)

(4) a myth about the afterlife (107c-115a)

(5) a description of the final moments of Socrates’ life (115a-118a)

The dialogue commences with a conversation (57a-59c) between two characters, Echecrates and Phaedo, occurring sometime after Socrates’ death in the Greek city of Phlius.  The former asks the latter, who was present on that day, to recount what took place.  Phaedo begins by explaining why some time had elapsed between Socrates’ trial and his execution: the Athenians had sent their annual religious mission to Delos the day before the trial, and executions are forbidden until the mission returns.  He also lists the friends who were present and describes their mood as “an unaccustomed mixture of pleasure and pain,” since Socrates appeared happy and without fear but his friends knew that he was going to die.  He agrees to tell the whole story from the beginning; within this story the main interlocutors are Socrates, Simmias, and Cebes.  Some commentators on the dialogue have taken the latter two characters to be followers of the philosopher Pythagoras (570-490 B.C).

a. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)

Socrates’ friends learn that he will die on the present day, since the mission from Delos has returned.  They go in to the prison to find Socrates with his wife Xanthippe and their baby, who are then sent away.  Socrates, rubbing the place on his leg where his just removed bonds had been, remarks on how strange it is that a man cannot have both pleasure and pain at the same time, yet when he pursues and catches one, he is sure to meet with the other as well.  Cebes asks Socrates about the poetry he is said to have begun writing, since Evenus (a Sophist teacher, not present) was wondering about this.  Socrates relates how certain dreams have caused him to do so, and says that he is presently putting Aesop’s fables into verse.  He then asks Cebes to convey to Evenus his farewell, and to tell him that—even though it would be wrong to take his own life—he, like any philosopher, should be prepared to follow Socrates to his death.

Here the conversation turns toward an examination of the philosopher’s attitude toward death.  The discussion starts with the question of suicide.  If philosophers are so willing to die, asks Cebes, why is it wrong for them to kill themselves?  Socrates’ initial answer is that the gods are our guardians, and that they will be angry if one of their possessions kills itself without permission.  As Cebes and Simmias immediately point out, however, this appears to contradict his earlier claim that the philosopher should be willing to die: for what truly wise man would want to leave the service of the best of all masters, the gods?

In reply to their objection, Socrates offers to “make a defense” of his view, as if he were in court, and submits that he hopes this defense will be more convincing to them than it was to the jury.  (He is referring here, of course, to his defense at his trial, which is recounted in Plato’s Apology.) The thesis to be supported is a generalized version of his earlier advice to Evenus: that “the one aim of those who practice philosophy in the proper manner is to practice for dying and death” (64a3-4).

Socrates begins his defense of this thesis, which takes up the remainder of the present section, by defining death as the separation of body and soul.  This definition goes unchallenged by his interlocutors, as does its dualistic assumption that body and soul are two distinct entities.   (The Greek word psuchē is only roughly approximate to our word “soul”; the Greeks thought of psuchē as what makes something alive, and Aristotle talks about non-human animals and even plants as having souls in this sense.)  Granted that death is a soul/body separation, Socrates sets forth a number of reasons why philosophers are prepared for such an event.  First, the true philosopher despises bodily pleasures such as food, drink, and sex, so he more than anyone else wants to free himself from his body (64d-65a).  Additionally, since the bodily senses are inaccurate and deceptive, the philosopher’s search for knowledge is most successful when the soul is “most by itself.”

The latter point holds especially for the objects of philosophical knowledge that Plato later on in the dialogue (103e) refers to as “Forms.”  Here Forms are mentioned for what is perhaps the first time in Plato’s dialogues: the Just itself, the Beautiful, and the Good; Bigness, Health, and Strength; and “in a word, the reality of all other things, that which each of them essentially is” (65d).  They are best approached not by sense perception but by pure thought alone. These entities are granted again without argument by Simmias and Cebes, and are discussed in more detail later. .

All told, then, the body is a constant impediment to philosophers in their search for truth: “It fills us with wants, desires, fears, all sorts of illusions and much nonsense, so that, as it is said, in truth and in fact no thought of any kind ever comes to us from the body” (66c).  To have pure knowledge, therefore, philosophers must escape from the influence of the body as much as is possible in this life. Philosophy itself is, in fact, a kind of “training for dying” (67e), a purification of the philosopher’s soul from its bodily attachment.

Thus, Socrates concludes, it would be unreasonable for a philosopher to fear death, since upon dying he is most likely to obtain the wisdom which he has been seeking his whole life.  Both the philosopher’s courage in the face of death and his moderation with respect to bodily pleasures which result from the pursuit of wisdom stand in stark contrast to the courage and moderation practiced by ordinary people.  (Wisdom, courage, and moderation are key virtues in Plato’s writings, and are included in his definition of justice in the Republic.) Ordinary people are only brave in regard to some things because they fear even worse things happening, and only moderate in relation to some pleasures because they want to be immoderate with respect to others.  But this is only “an illusory appearance of virtue”—for as it happens, “moderation and courage and justice are a purging away of all such things, and wisdom itself is a kind of cleansing or purification” (69b-c).  Since Socrates counts himself among these philosophers, why wouldn’t he be prepared to meet death?  Thus ends his defense.

b. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)

But what about those, says Cebes, who believe that the soul is destroyed when a person dies?  To persuade them that it continues to exist on its own will require some compelling argument.  Readers should note several important features of Cebes’ brief objection (70a-b).  First, he presents the belief in the immortality of the soul as an uncommon belief (“men find it hard to believe . . .”).  Secondly, he identifies two things which need to be demonstrated in order to convince those who are skeptical: (a) that the soul continues to exist after a person’s death, and (b) that it still possesses intelligence.  The first argument that Socrates deploys appears to be intended to respond to (a), and the second to (b).

i. The Cyclical Argument (70c-72e)

Socrates mentions an ancient theory holding that just as the souls of the dead in the underworld come from those living in this world, the living souls come back from those of the dead (70c-d).  He uses this theory as the inspiration for his first argument, which may be reconstructed as follows:

1. All things come to be from their opposite states: for example, something that comes to be “larger” must necessarily have been “smaller” before (70e-71a).

2. Between every pair of opposite states there are two opposite processes: for example, between the pair “smaller” and “larger” there are the processes “increase” and “decrease” (71b).

3. If the two opposite processes did not balance each other out, everything would eventually be in the same state: for example, if increase did not balance out decrease, everything would keep becoming smaller and smaller (72b).

4.  Since “being alive” and “being dead” are opposite states, and “dying” and “coming-to-life” are the two opposite processes between these states, coming-to-life must balance out dying (71c-e).

5. Therefore, everything that dies must come back to life again (72a).

A main question that arises in regard to this argument is what Socrates means by “opposites.” We can see at least two different ways in which this term is used in reference to the opposed states he mentions.  In a first sense, it is used for “comparatives” such as larger and smaller (and also the pairs weaker/stronger and swifter/slower at 71a), opposites which admit of various degrees and which even may be present in the same object at once (on this latter point, see 102b-c).  However, Socrates also refers to “being alive” and “being dead” as opposites—but this pair is rather different from comparative states such as larger and smaller, since something can’t be deader, but only dead.  Being alive and being dead are what logicians call “contraries” (as opposed to “contradictories,” such as “alive” and “not-alive,” which exclude any third possibility).  With this terminology in mind, some contemporary commentators have maintained that the argument relies on covertly shifting between these different kinds of opposites.

Clever readers may notice other apparent difficulties as well.  Does the principle about balance in (3), for instance, necessarily apply to living things?  Couldn’t all life simply cease to exist at some point, without returning?  Moreover, how does Plato account for adding new living souls to the human population?  While these questions are perhaps not unanswerable from the point of view of the present argument, we should keep in mind that Socrates has several arguments remaining, and he later suggests that this first one should be seen as complementing the second (77c-d).

ii. The Argument from Recollection (72e-78b)

Cebes mentions that the soul’s immortality also is supported by Socrates’ theory that learning is “recollection” (a theory which is, by most accounts, distinctively Platonic, and one that plays a role in his dialogues Meno and Phaedrus as well).  As evidence of this theory he mentions instances in which people can “recollect” answers to questions they did not previously appear to possess when this knowledge is elicited from them using the proper methods. This is likely a reference to the Meno (82b ff.), where Socrates elicits knowledge about basic geometry from a slave-boy by asking the latter a series of questions to guide him in the right direction. Asked by Simmias to elaborate further upon this doctrine, Socrates explains that recollection occurs “when a man sees or hears or in some other way perceives one thing and not only knows that thing but also thinks of another thing of which the knowledge is not the same but different . . .” (73c).  For example, when a lover sees his beloved’s lyre, the image of his beloved comes into his mind as well, even though the lyre and the beloved are two distinct things.

Based on this theory, Socrates now commences a second proof for the soul’s immortality—one which is referred to with approval in later passages in the dialogue (77a-b, 87a, 91e-92a, and 92d-e). The argument may be reconstructed as follows:

1. Things in the world which appear to be equal in measurement are in fact deficient in the equality they possess (74b, d-e).

2. Therefore, they are not the same as true equality, that is, “the Equal itself” (74c).

3. When we see the deficiency of the examples of equality, it helps us to think of, or “recollect,” the Equal itself (74c-d).

4. In order to do this, we must have had some prior knowledge of the Equal itself (74d-e).

5. Since this knowledge does not come from sense-perception, we must have acquired it before we acquired sense-perception, that is, before we were born (75b ff.).

6. Therefore, our souls must have existed before we were born. (76d-e)

With regard to premise (1), in what respect are this-worldly instances of equality deficient?  Socrates mentions that two apparently equal sticks, for example, “fall short” of true equality and are thus “inferior” to it (74e).  Why?  His reasoning at 74b8-9—that the sticks “sometimes, while remaining the same, appear to one to be equal and another to be unequal”—is notoriously ambiguous, and has been the subject of much scrutiny.  He could mean that the sticks may appear as equal or unequal to different observers, or perhaps they appear as equal when measured against one thing but not another.  In any case, the notion that the sensible world is imperfect is a standard view of the middle dialogues (see Republic 479b-c for a similar example), and  is emphasized further in his next argument.

By “true equality” and “the Equal itself” in premises (2)-(4), Socrates is referring to the Form of Equality.  It is this entity with respect to which the sensible instances of equality fall short—and indeed, Socrates says that the Form is “something else beyond all these.”  His brief argument at 74a-c that true equality is something altogether distinct from any visible instances of equality is of considerable interest, since it is one of few places in the middle dialogues where he makes an explicit argument for why there must be Forms. The conclusion of the second argument for the soul’s immortality extends what has been said about equality to other Forms as well: “If those realities we are always talking about exist, the Beautiful and the Good and all that kind of reality, and we refer all the things we perceive to that reality, discovering that it existed before and is ours, and we compare these things with it, then, just as they exist, so our soul must exist before we are born” (76d-e).  The process of recollection is initiated not just when we see imperfectly equal things, then, but when we see things that appear to be beautiful or good as well; experience of all such things inspires us to recollect the relevant Forms.  Moreover, if these Forms are never available to us in our sensory experience, we must have learned them even before we were capable of having such experience.

Simmias agrees with the argument so far, but says that this still does not prove that our souls exist after death, but only before birth.  This difficulty, Socrates suggests, can be resolved by combining the present argument with the one from opposites: the soul comes to life from out of death, so it cannot avoid existing after death as well.  He does not elaborate on this suggestion, however, and instead proceeds to offer a third argument.

iii. The Affinity Argument (78b-84b)

The third argument for the soul’s immortality is referred to by commentators as the “affinity argument,” since it turns on the idea that the soul has a likeness to a higher level of reality:

1. There are two kinds of existences: (a) the visible world that we perceive with our senses, which is human, mortal, composite, unintelligible, and always changing, and (b) the invisible world of Forms that we can access solely with our minds, which is divine, deathless, intelligible, non-composite, and always the same (78c-79a, 80b).

2. The soul is more like world (b), whereas the body is more like world (a) (79b-e).

3. Therefore, supposing it has been freed of bodily influence through philosophical training, the soul is most likely to make its way to world (b) when the body dies (80d-81a).  (If, however, the soul is polluted by bodily influence, it likely will stay bound to world (a) upon death (81b-82b).)

Note that this argument is intended to establish only the probability of the soul’s continued existence after the death of the body—“what kind of thing,” Socrates asks at the outset, “is likely to be scattered [after the death of the body]?” (78b; my italics)  Further, premise (2) appears to rest on an analogy between the soul and body and the two kinds of realities mentioned in (1), a style of argument that Simmias will criticize later (85e ff.).  Indeed, since Plato himself appends several pages of objections by Socrates’ interlocutors to this argument, one might wonder how authoritative he takes it to be.

Yet Socrates’ reasoning about the soul at 78c-79a states an important feature of Plato’s middle period metaphysics, sometimes referred to as his “two-world theory.”  In this picture of reality, the world perceived by the senses is set against the world of Forms, with each world being populated by fundamentally different kinds of entities:

The World of the Senses The World of Forms
Composites (that is, things with parts) Non-composites
Things that never remain the same from one moment to the next Things that always remain the same and don’t tolerate any change
Any particular thing that is equal, beautiful, and so forth The Equal, the Beautiful, and what each thing is in itself
That which is visible That which is grasped by the mind and invisible

Since the body is like one world and the soul like the other, it would be strange to think that even though the body lasts for some time after a person’s death, the soul immediately dissolves and exists no further.  Given the respective affinities of the body and soul, Socrates spends the rest of the argument (roughly 80d-84b) expanding on the earlier point (from his “defense”) that philosophers should focus on the latter. This section has some similarities to the myth about the afterlife, which he narrates near the dialogue’s end; note that some of the details of the account here of what happens after death are characterized as merely “likely.” A soul which is purified of bodily things, Socrates says, will make its way to the divine when the body dies, whereas an impure soul retains its share in the visible after death, becoming a wandering phantom.  Of the impure souls, those who have been immoderate will later become donkeys or similar animals, the unjust will become wolves or hawks, those with only ordinary non-philosophical virtue will become social creatures such as bees or ants.

The philosopher, on the other hand, will join the company of the gods.  For philosophy brings deliverance from bodily imprisonment, persuading the soul “to trust only itself and whatever reality, existing by itself, the soul by itself understands, and not to consider as true whatever it examines by other means, for this is different in different circumstances and is sensible and visible, whereas what the soul itself sees is intelligible and indivisible” (83a6-b4).  The philosopher thus avoids the “greatest and most extreme evil” that comes from the senses: that of violent pleasures and pains which deceive one into thinking that what causes them is genuine.  Hence, after death, his soul will join with that to which it is akin, namely, the divine.

c. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)

After a long silence, Socrates tells Simmias and Cebes not to worry about objecting to any of what he has just said.  For he, like the swan that sings beautifully before it dies, is dedicated to the service of Apollo, and thus filled with a gift of prophecy that makes him hopeful for what death will bring.

i. The Objections (85c-88c)

Simmias prefaces his objection by making a remark about methodology.  While certainty, he says, is either impossible or difficult,  it would show a weak spirit not to make a complete investigation.  If at the end of this investigation one fails to find the truth, one should adopt the best theory and cling to it like a raft, either until one dies or comes upon something sturdier.

This being said, he proceeds to challenge Socrates’ third argument.  For one might put forth a similar argument which claims that the soul is like a harmony and the body is like a lyre and its strings.  In fact, Simmias claims that “we really do suppose the soul to be something of this kind,” that is, a harmony or proper mixture of bodily elements like the hot and cold or dry and moist (86b-c).  (Some commentators think  the “we” here refers to followers of Pythagoras.)  But even though a musical harmony is invisible and akin to the divine, it will cease to exist when the lyre is destroyed.  Following the soul-as-harmony thesis, the same would be true of the soul when the body dies.

Next Socrates asks if Cebes has any objections.  The latter says that he is convinced by Socrates’ argument that the soul exists before birth, but still doubts whether it continues to exist after death.   In support of his doubt, he invokes a metaphor of his own.  Suppose someone were to say that since a man lasts longer than his cloak, it follows that if the cloak is still there the man must be there too.  We would certainly think this statement was nonsense. (He appears to be refering to Socrates’ argument at 80c-e here.)  Just as a man might wear out many cloaks before he dies, the soul might use up many bodies before it dies.  So even supposing everything else is granted, if “one does not further agree that the soul is not damaged by its many births and is not, in the end, altogether destroyed in one of those deaths, he might say that no one knows which death and dissolution of the body brings about the destruction of the soul, since not one of us can be aware of this” (88a-b).  In light of this uncertainty, one should always face death with fear.

ii. Interlude on Misology (89b-91c)

After a short exchange in the meta-dialogue in which Phaedo and Echecrates praise Socrates’ pleasant attitude throughout this discussion, Socrates begins his response with a warning that they not become misologues.  Misology, he says, arises in much the same way that misanthropy does: when someone with little experience puts his trust in another person, but later finds him to be unreliable, his first reaction is to blame this on the depraved nature of people in general.  If he had more knowledge and experience, however, he would not be so quick to make this leap, for he would realize that most people fall somewhere in between the extremes of good and bad, and he merely happened to encounter someone at one end of the spectrum.  A similar caution applies to arguments.  If someone thinks a particular argument is sound, but later finds out that it is not, his first inclination will be to think that all arguments are unsound; yet instead of blaming arguments in general and coming to hate reasonable discussion, we should blame our own lack of skill and experience.

iii. Response to Simmias (91e-95a)

Socrates then puts forth three counter-arguments to Simmias’ objection.  To begin, he gets both Simmias and Cebes to agree that the theory of recollection is true.  But if this is so, then Simmias is not able to “harmonize” his view that the soul is a harmony dependent on the body with the recollection view that the soul exists before birth.  Simmias admits this inconsistency, and says that he in fact prefers the theory of recollection to the other view.  Nonetheless, Socrates proceeds to make two additional points.  First, if the soul is a harmony, he contends, it can have no share in the disharmony of wickedness.  But this implies that all souls are equally good.  Second, if the soul is never out of tune with its component parts (as shown at 93a), then it seems like it could never oppose these parts.  But in fact it does the opposite, “ruling over all the elements of which one says it is composed, opposing nearly all of them throughout life, directing all their ways, inflicting harsh and painful punishment on them, . . . holding converse with desires and passions and fears, as if it were one thing talking to a different one . . .” (94c9-d5).  A passage in Homer, wherein Odysseus beats his breast and orders his heart to endure, strengthens this picture of the opposition between soul and bodily emotions.  Given these counter-arguments, Simmias agrees that the soul-as-harmony thesis cannot be correct.

iv. Response to Cebes (95a-107b)

1. Socrates’ Intellectual History (96a-102a)

After summarizing Cebes’ objection that the soul may outlast the body yet not be immortal, Socrates says that this problem requires “a thorough investigation of the cause of generation and destruction” (96a; the Greek word aitia, translated as “cause,” has the more general meaning of “explanation”).  He now proceeds to relate his own examinations into this subject, recalling in turn his youthful puzzlement about the topic, his initial attraction to a solution given by the philosopher Anaxagoras (500-428 B.C.), and finally his development of his own method of explanation involving Forms.  It is debated whether this account is meant to describe Socrates’ intellectual autobiography or Plato’s own, since the theory of Forms generally is described as the latter’s distinctive contribution.  (Some commentators have suggested that it may be neither, but instead just good storytelling on Plato’s part.)

When Socrates was young, he says, he was excited by natural science, and wanted to know the explanation of everything from how living things are nourished to how things occur in the heavens and on earth.  But then he realized that he had no ability for such investigations, since they caused him to unlearn many of the things he thought he had previously known.   He used to think, for instance, that people grew larger by various kinds of external nourishment combining with the appropriate parts of our bodies, for example, by food adding flesh to flesh.  But what is it which makes one person larger than another?   Or for that matter, which makes one and one add up to two?  It seems like it can’t be simply the two things coming near one another.   Because of puzzles like these, Socrates is now forced to admit his ignorance: “I do not any longer persuade myself that I know why a unit or anything else comes to be, or perishes or exists by the old method of investigation, and I do not accept it, but I have a confused method of my own” (97b).

This method came about as follows.  One day after his initial setbacks Socrates happened to hear of Anaxagoras’ view that Mind directs and causes all things.  He took this to mean that everything was arranged for the best.  Therefore, if one wanted to know the explanation of something, one only had to know what was best for that thing.  Suppose, for instance, that Socrates wanted to know why the heavenly bodies move the way they do.  Anaxagoras would show him how this was the best possible way for each of them to be.  And once he had taught Socrates what the best was for each thing individually, he then would explain the overall good that they all share in common.  Yet upon studying Anaxagoras further, Socrates found these expectations disappointed.  It turned out that Anaxagoras did not talk about Mind as cause at all, but rather about air and ether and other mechanistic explanations.  For Socrates, however, this sort of explanation was simply unacceptable:

To call those things causes is too absurd.  If someone said that without bones and sinews and all such things, I should not be able to do what I decided, he would be right, but surely to say that they are the cause of what I do, and not that I have chosen the best course, even though I act with my mind, is to speak very lazily and carelessly.  Imagine not being able to distinguish the real cause from that without which the cause would not be able to act as a cause. (99a-b)

Frustrated at finding a teacher who would provide a teleological explanation of these phenomena, Socrates settled for what he refers to as his “second voyage” (99d).  This new method consists in taking what seems to him to be the most convincing theory—the theory of Forms—as his basic hypothesis, and judging everything else in accordance with it.  In other words, he assumes the existence of the Beautiful, the Good, and so on, and employs them as explanations for all the other things.  If something is beautiful, for instance, the “safe answer” he now offers for what makes it such is “the presence of,” or “sharing in,” the Beautiful (100d).  Socrates does not go into any detail here about the relationship between the Form and object that shares in it, but only claims that “all beautiful things are beautiful by the Beautiful” (100d).  In regard to the phenomena that puzzled him as a young man, he offers the same answer.  What makes a big thing big, or a bigger thing bigger, is the Form Bigness.  Similarly, if one and one are said to be two, it is because they share in Twoness, whereas previously each shared in Oneness.

2. The Final Argument (102b-107b)

When Socrates has finished describing this method, both Simmias and Cebes agree that what he has said is true.  Their accord with his view is echoed in another brief interlude by Echecrates and Phaedo, in which the former says that Socrates has “made these things wonderfully clear to anyone of even the smallest intelligence,” and Phaedo adds that all those present agreed with Socrates as well.  Returning again to the prison scene, Socrates now uses this as the basis of a fourth argument that the soul is immortal.  One may reconstruct this argument as follows:

1. Nothing can become its opposite while still being itself: it either flees away or is destroyed at the approach of its opposite.  (For example, “tallness” cannot become “shortness” while still being “hot.”) (102d-103a)

2. This is true not only of opposites, but in a similar way of things that contain opposites.  (For example, “fire” and “snow” are not themselves opposites, but “fire” always brings “hot” with it, and “snow” always brings “cold” with it.  So “fire” will not become “cold” without ceasing to be “fire,” nor will “snow” become “hot” without ceasing to be “snow.”) (103c-105b)

3. The “soul” always brings “life” with it. (105c-d)

4. Therefore “soul” will never admit the opposite of “life,” that is, “death,” without ceasing to be “soul.” (105d-e)

5. But what does not admit death is also indestructible. (105e-106d)

6. Therefore, the soul is indestructible. (106e-107a)

When someone objects that premise (1) contradicts his earlier statement (at 70d-71a) about opposites arising from one another, Socrates responds that then he was speaking of things with opposite properties, whereas here is talking about the opposites themselves.  Careful readers will distinguish three different ontological items at issue in this passage:

(a) the thing (for example, Simmias) that participates in a Form (for example, that of Tallness), but can come to participate in the opposite Form (of Shortness) without thereby changing that which it is (namely, Simmias)

(b) the Form (for example, of Tallness), which cannot admit its opposite (Shortness)

(c) the Form-in-the-thing (for example, the tallness in Simmias), which cannot admit its opposite (shortness) without fleeing away of being destroyed

Premise (2) introduces another item:

(d) a kind of entity (for example, fire) that, even though it does not share the same name as a Form, always participates in that Form (for example, Hotness), and therefore always excludes the opposite Form (Coldness) wherever it (fire) exists

This new kind of entity puts Socrates beyond the “safe answer” given before (at 100d) about how a thing participates in a Form.  His new, “more sophisticated answer” is to say that what makes a body hot is not heat—the safe answer—but rather an entity such as fire.  In like manner, what makes a body sick is not sickness but fever, and what makes a number odd is not oddness but oneness (105b-c).  Premise (3) then states that the soul is this sort of entity with respect to the Form of Life.  And just as fire always brings the Form of Hotness and excludes that of Coldness, the soul will always bring the Form of Life with it and exclude its opposite.

However, one might wonder about premise (5).  Even though fire, to return to Socrates’ example, does not admit Coldness, it still may be destroyed in the presence of something cold—indeed, this was one of the alternatives mentioned in premise (1).  Similarly, might not the soul, while not admitting death, nonetheless be destroyed by its presence?  Socrates tries to block this possibility by appealing to what he takes to be a widely shared assumption, namely, that what is deathless is also indestructible: “All would agree . . . that the god, and the Form of Life itself, and anything that is deathless, are never destroyed” (107d).  For readers who do not agree that such items are deathless in the first place, however, this sort of appeal is unlikely to be acceptable.

Simmias, for his part, says he agrees with Socrates’ line of reasoning, although he admits that he may have misgivings about it later on.  Socrates says that this is only because their hypotheses need clearer examination—but upon examination they will be found convincing.

d. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)

The issue of the immortality of the soul, Socrates says, has considerable implications for morality.  If the soul is immortal, then we must worry about our souls not just in this life but for all time; if it is not, then there are no lasting consequences for those who are wicked.  But in fact, the soul is immortal, as the previous arguments have shown, and Socrates now begins to describe what happens when it journeys to the underworld after the death of the body.  The ensuing tale tells us of

(1) the judgment of the dead souls and their subsequent journey to the underworld (107d-108c)

(2) the shape of the earth and its regions (108c-113c)

(3) the punishment of the wicked and the reward of the pious philosophers (113d-114c)

Commentators commonly refer to this story as a “myth,” and Socrates himself describes it this way (using the Greek word muthos at 110b, which earlier on in the dialogue (61b) he has contrasted with logos, or “argument.”).  Readers should be aware that for the Greeks myth did not have the negative connotations it often carries today, as when we say, for instance, that something is “just a myth” or when we distinguish myth from fact.  While Plato’s relation to traditional Greek mythology is a complex one—see his critique of Homer and Hesiod in Republic Book II, for instance—he himself uses myths to bolster his doctrines not only in the Phaedo, but in dialogues such as the Gorgias, Republic, and Phaedrus as well.

At the end of his tale, Socrates says that what is important about his story is not its literal details, but rather that we “risk the belief” that “this, or something like this, is true about our souls and their dwelling places,” and repeat such a tale to ourselves as though it were an “incantation” (114d).  Doing so will keep us in good spirits as we work to improve our souls in this life.  The myth thus reinforces the dialogue’s recommendation of the practice of philosophy as care for one’s soul.

e. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

The depiction of Socrates’ death that closes the Phaedo is rich in dramatic detail.  It also is complicated by a couple of difficult interpretative questions.

After Socrates has finished his tale about the afterlife, he says that it is time for him to prepare to take the hemlock poison required by his death sentence.  When Crito asks him what his final instructions are for his burial, Socrates reminds him that what will remain with them after death is not Socrates himself, but rather just his body, and tells him that they can bury it however they want.  Next he takes a bath—so that his corpse will not have to be cleaned post-mortem—and says farewell to his wife and three sons.  Even the officer sent to carry out Socrates’ punishment is moved to tears at this point, and describes Socrates as “the noblest, the gentlest and the best man” who has ever been at the prison.

Crito tells Socrates that some condemned men put off taking the poison for as long as possible, in order to enjoy their last moments in feasting or sex.  Socrates, however, asks for the poison to be brought immediately.  He drinks it calmly and in good cheer, and chastises his friends for their weeping.  When his legs begin to feel heavy, he lies down; the numbness in his body travels upward until eventually it reaches his heart.

Some contemporary scholars have challenged Plato’s description of hemlock-poisoning, arguing that in fact the symptoms would have been much more violent than the relatively gentle death he depicts.  If these scholars are right, why does Plato depict the death scene the way he does?  There is also a dispute about Socrates’ last words, which invoke a sacrificial offering made by the sick to the god of medicine: “Crito, we owe a cock to Asclepius; make this offering to him and do not forget.”  Did Socrates view life as a kind of sickness?

4. References and Further Reading

a. General Commentaries

  • Bostock, D. Plato’s Phaedo. Oxford, 1986.
    • In-depth yet accessible discussion of the dialogue’s arguments (does not include text of the Phaedo).  Includes a helpful chapter on the theory of Forms.
  • Dorter, K. Plato’s Phaedo: An Interpretation. University of Toronto Press, 1982.
    • Reading of the dialogue that combines both dramatic and doctrinal approaches (does not include text of the Phaedo).
  • Gallop, D. Plato: Phaedo. Oxford, 1975.
    • English translation with separate commentary that focuses on the dialogue’s argumentation.
  • Hackforth, R. Plato’s Phaedo: Translated with an Introduction and Commentary. Cambridge, 1955.
    • English translation with running commentary.
  • Rowe, C.J. Plato: Phaedo. Cambridge, 1993.
    • Original Greek text (no English) with introduction and detailed textual commentary.

b. The Philosopher and Death (59c-69e)

  • Pakaluk, M. “Degrees of Separation in the ‘Phaedo.’” Phronesis 48 (2003) 89-115.
    • Discusses Plato’s notion of the soul-body distinction at 63a-69e.
  • Warren, J. “Socratic Suicide.” The Journal of Hellenic Studies 121 (2001) 91-106.
    • On the Platonic philosopher’s attitude toward suicide in the 61e-69e passage.
  • Weiss, R. "The Right Exchange: Phaedo 69a6-c3". Ancient Philosophy 7 (1987) 57-66.
    • Examines the notion that wisdom is the highest goal of the philosopher.

c. Three Arguments for the Soul’s Immortality (69e-84b)

  • Ackrill, J.L. “Anamnēsis in the Phaedo,” in E.N. Lee and A.P.D. Mourelatos (eds.) Exegesis and Argument: Studies in Greek Philosophy Presented to Gregory Vlastos. Assen, 1973. 177-95.
    • On the theory of recollection (73c-75).
  • Apolloni, D. “Plato’s Affinity Argument for the Immortality of the Soul.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 34 (1996) 5-32.
    • A study of the argument at 78b-80d.
  • Gallop, D. “Plato’s ‘Cyclical Argument’ Recycled.” Phronesis 27 (1982) 207-222.
    • On the first argument for the soul’s immortality (69e-72e) and its relation to the other arguments.
  • Matthen, M.  “Forms and Participants in Plato’s Phaedo.”  Noûs 18:2 (1984) 281-297.
    • Discusses Plato’s argument concerning equals at 74b7-c6.
  • Nehamas, A. “Plato on the Imperfection of the Sensible World,” in G. Fine, ed., Plato 1: Metaphysics and Epistemology. Oxford, 1999. 171-191.
    • On Plato’s view of sensible particulars, especially at 72e-78b.

d. Objections from Simmias and Cebes, and Socrates’ Response (84c-107b)

  • Frede, D.  “The Final Proof of the Immortality of the Soul in Plato’s Phaedo 102a-107a.”  Phronesis 23 (1978) 27-41.
    • A defense of Plato’s argument and examination of its underlying assumptions regarding the soul.
  • Gottschalk, H.D. “Soul as Harmonia.” Phronesis 16 (1971) 179-198.
    • Discusses Simmias’ account of the soul beginning at 85e.
  • Vlastos, G. “Reasons and Causes in the Phaedo,” in Plato: A Collection of Critical Essays, Vol. I: Metaphysics and Epistemology.  Garden City, NY: Anchor Books, 1971.
    • Are Forms causes? An examination of 95e-105c.
  • Wiggins, D. “Teleology and the Good in Plato’s Phaedo.”  Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 4 (1986) 1-18.
    • On Socrates’ “second voyage” beginning at 99c2-d1.

e. The Myth about the Afterlife (107c-115a)

  • Annas, J. “Plato’s Myths of Judgment.” Phronesis 27 (1982) 119-43.
    • A study of Plato’s myths in the GorgiasPhaedo, and Republic.
  • Morgan, K.A. Myth and Philosophy from the pre-Socratics to Plato. Cambridge, 2000.
    • Includes extensive background on myth in Plato, as well as discussion of the Phaedo myth in particular.
  • Sedley, D. “Teleology and Myth in the Phaedo.” Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 5 (1990) 359–83.

f. Socrates’ Death (115a-118a)

  • Crook, J. “Socrates’ Last Words: Another Look at an Ancient Riddle.” Classical Quarterly 48 (1998) 117-125.
    • The papers by Crook and Most (cited below) consider some puzzles regarding Socrates’ final words at the dialogue’s end.
  • Gill, C. “The Death of Socrates.” Classical Quarterly 23 (1973) 25-25.
    • On the finer details of hemlock-poisoning.
  • Most, G.W. “A Cock for Asclepius.” Classical Quarterly 43 (1993) 96-111.
  • Stewart, D. “Socrates’ Last Bath.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 10 (1972) 253-9.
    • Looks at the deeper meaning of Socrates’ bath at 116a.
  • Wilson, E. The Death of Socrates. Harvard University Press, 2007.
    • Includes discussion of the death scene in the Phaedo, as well as its subsequent reception in Western philosophy, art, and culture.

Author Information

Tim Connolly
East Stroudsburg University
U. S. A.

Chrysippus (c. 280—207 B.C.E.)


Chrysippus was among the most influential philosophers of the Hellenistic period. He is usually thought of as the most important influence on Stoicism. A later Stoic catchphrase ran, "If Chrysippus had not existed, neither would the Stoa." (Lives 292). Carneades, the fourth Chair of the New Academy, modified the phrase to, "If Chrysippus had not existed, neither would I." (Lives 438) Chrysippus defended and developed an empiricist epistemology and psychology. He offered important alternatives to the metaphysical theories of Aristotle and Plato, defending a thoroughgoing materialist ontology. His views concerning freedom and determinism continue to generate interest, and he is thought to have endorsed a form of compatibilism countenancing both freedom of the will and a deterministic cosmos. His work in logic was considerable, as he developed, as an alternative to the logic of Aristotle, a kind of propositional logic. As an ethicist, he maintained that the life of human happiness and the life of virtue are one and the same. He seems to have thought virtue is best understood as related essentially, if not entirely reducible, to wisdom. And he thought wisdom derives especially from the study of natural philosophy. That Chrysippus would take wisdom to derive primarily from the study of natural philosophy may be explained, in part, by his conviction that the cosmos exists in accordance with proper ends.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Times
  2. Sources
  3. Epistemology
    1. Perception
    2. Epistemic Criteria
  4. Logic
    1. Arguments
    2. Propositions
    3. Modality
  5. Metaphysics
    1. Ontology
    2. Being, Being Something, and the Nature of Properties
    3. The Growing Argument
    4. Freedom and Necessity
  6. Ethics
    1. Eudaimonism
    2. The Unity of Virtues
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Other References

1. Life and Times

Chrysippus was born in Soli, near what is today known as Mersin, Turkey. He died in the 143rd Olympiad at the age of seventy-three (living c. 280-207 B.C.E.). Diogenes Laertius, in his Lives of the Philosophers, reports that before becoming a student of Cleanthes, Chrysippus used to practice as a long-distance runner (287 B.C.E.). He was a master dialectician. Most people thought, according to Diogenes Laertius, that if the gods took to dialectic, they would adopt no other system than that of Chrysippus (289 B.C.E.). Cleanthes had succeeded Zeno, who had founded the school at the Stoa Poikilê in 262 B.C.E. Chrysippus, having taught outside the school for a number of years, returned to succeed his former teacher in 230 B.C.E. Stoicism continued to flourish after his death, as the work begun by early Stoics was continued in the era of Panaetius and Posidonius, and later into the Roman Imperial period by thinkers such as Seneca, Epictetus, and Marcus Aurelius.

2. Sources

Chrysippus was a prolific writer. He is reported to have written more than 705 books (SVF 2.1). No single treatise remains, and we have something in the neighborhood of 475 fragments. Two doxographies stand out—Diogenes Laertius’ Lives of the Philosophers, hereafter, and above, (Lives), and pseudo-Plutarch’s Philosopher’s Opinions on Nature. Cicero writes several works that are of use in reconstructing Stoic thought: Academica, De Finibus, and De Natura Deorum, are among the most important. These contain summaries and critical evaluations of the views of the Hellenistic schools, and although Cicero identifies with the Academics, he is not without sympathy for Stoic philosophy. It is from these sources primarily that scholars have attempted to cobble together a set of fragments and testimonia that present a coherent picture of Stoicism and Stoic philosophers. The Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta, hereafter (SVF), compiled in three volumes by H. von Arnim, is one of the more important collections of fragments in Greek and Latin, and it is customary to refer to Stoic fragments by making use of von Arnim’s volume numbers and numbering system. More recently, David Sedley and A.A. Long have produced an English translation and commentary of the principal sources of Hellenistic philosophy, The Hellenistic Philosophers, hereafter (LS). Corresponding Greek and Latin texts, with notes and bibliography, can be found in the second volume of this work.

3. Epistemology

a. Perception

Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, defined ‘presentation’ as an impression (phantasia) upon the soul (SVF I 58). That he neglected to indicate what he meant by ‘impression’ is suggested by the controversy between Cleanthes and Chrysippus concerning the exegesis of this term. Cleanthes maintained that an object impresses itself on the soul just as a signet ring impresses itself upon a wax seal—a metaphor Plato had made use of in the Theaetetus (191c8). Chrysippus rejects this model by arguing that if the soul were like a piece of wax (with only one surface exposed), it might only receive one impression at a time. Furthermore, every impression would be lost as the next image impinged upon the former. The soul, however, as Chrysippus argues, receives a number of impressions at once, and it does, in fact, retain some impression while receiving others (Lives 7.50). In place of the wax model, Chrysippus argues that the soul is more akin to air, as air is able to undergo a number of alterations simultaneously, as when a number of individuals are speaking at the same time in the same place. (In fact, the soul, according to Chrysippus, who was a thoroughgoing materialist, is a mixture of air and fire). Chrysippus seems, therefore, to accept an indirect realist view of perception, whereby an impression can represent an external object, i.e., a phantaston:

Chrysippus says that these four, [impression, impressor, imagination, and figment] are to be distinguished from one another. An impression is an affection occurring in the soul that reveals itself and its cause. Thus, when through sight we observe something white, the affection is what is engendered in the soul through vision; and it is this affection (pathos) that enables us to say there is a white object that activates us. The word ‘impression’ (phantasia) is derived from the word light (phõs); just as light reveals itself and whatever else it includes in its range, so impression reveals itself and its cause. (SVF 2.54)

Not every presentation is, however, accurate. Some presentations lack a corresponding ‘impressor’. Although we see what appears to be Clint Eastwood on the silver screen, nobody believes that Clint is actually up there (LS 236). Chrysippus considers a presentation such as this one to be the result of imagination, or a phantastikon. A presentation that is believed, but which lacks an underlying real object, as for example the dragoness of Hades as it appears to Orestes, would be classified as a figment, or a phantasma.

Imagination is an empty attraction, an affection in the soul which arises from no impressor…A figment is that to which we are attracted in the empty attraction of imagination; it occurs in people who are melancholic and mad. (SVF 2.54)

b. Epistemic Criteria

So how does the ruling element of the soul distinguish a real presentation from a mere figment? According to Diogenes Laertius, the Stoics maintained the following (Lives 155):

[W]ith respect to presentations, on the one hand there is the cataleptic, and on the other there is the non-cataleptic. The cataleptic, which they say is the criterion of things, is that which comes to be from an existent object, agrees with the real object itself, having been stamped and imprinted. The non-cataleptic does not come to be from the existent object, or if it does, fails to accord with that which exists; it is neither clear nor distinct.

A cataleptic (“apprehending” or “grasping”) presentation (i) comes from a real object (ii) accurately corresponds to that object, (iii) is imprinted on the sense faculty, and, as we might add, (iv) is clear and distinct. The Stoics, moreover, take the cataleptic impression to be the criterion by means of which one may discern fact from fiction. Needless to say, the Skeptics were eager to ask how it is that one may discern the cataleptic from the non-cataleptic. The conceptual landscape here is filled out aptly by Cicero in his Academica (2.83):

There are four headings to prove there is nothing that can be known, cognized, or grasped, which is the subject of this whole controversy. The first of these is that (i) some false impression does exist. The second is that (ii) it is not cognitive. The third is that (iii) impressions between which there is no difference cannot be such that some are cognitive and others not. The fourth is that (iv) no true impression arises from sensation that does not have alongside it another impression, no different from it, that is not cognitive. Everyone accepts the second and third of these. Epicurus does not grant the first, but you…[Stoics], with whom we are dealing, admit that one. The entire battle is about the fourth.

The Stoics seemed to have denied that a true and a false impression might nevertheless be qualitatively indistinguishable. But, as Cicero goes on to ask, what mark (notum) of a cataleptic impression might one have such that it could not be false? In response to Cicero’s question, the Stoics developed several strategies (Lives 162):

The standard of truth they claim is the cataleptic presentation, i.e., that which comes to be from a real object, according to Chrysippus in the twelfth book of his Physics, and to Antipater and Apollodorus. Boëthus, however, admits a plurality of standards, namely intelligence, sense-perception, appetency, and knowledge. But Chrysippus contradicts himself…and says that the criterion is sensation and preconception (prolepsis). And preconception is a natural concept of the universal. Again, certain others of the older Stoics make orthos logos the criterion; so also does Posidonius in his treatise On the Criterion.

The pivotal question for understanding Chrysippus’ epistemology seems to concern the meaning he attaches to prolepsis. On one reading, these preconceptions might be considered innate concepts. This reading, however, rings inconsonant with the empiricist leanings associated with the Stoics (SVF 2.83):

The Stoics say that whenever a person is born, the hegemonic part of his soul is like a sheet prepared to be written upon. Upon this he writes each one of his conceptions. The first method of inscription is via the senses. For by perceiving something, e.g., white, they have a memory of it when it has departed. And when many memories of a similar kind have occurred, we then say we have experience. For the plurality of similar experiences is experience. Some conceptions arise naturally in the previously mentioned ways without deliberation, others by means of our own instruction and attention. The latter are called merely conceptions. The former are called preconceptions (prolepseis) as well. Reason, for (possessing) which we are called rational, is said to be completed by means of our preconceptions during our first seven years.

The above passage suggests that Stoics viewed the mind as a tabula rasa. Concepts, or prolepseis, are acquired causally by the repetition of similar presentations. (See Aristotle’s Posteria Analytica II.9) Chrysippus seems to have thought that one might compare a given token presentation with the concept one has of the type thereof. When, for example, the sage rejects the presentation of a dragoness, one may note that the dragoness does not match the prolepsis one has of females. If this is his line of thinking, it is fair to say that Chrysippus is sanguine indeed with respect to the reliability of the cognitive mechanism responsible for the acquisition of prolepseis. Optimism at this level, however, accords well with the Stoic view that the world is constructed in accordance with reason (Lives VII.134):

[The Stoics] think that there are two principles of the universe—that which acts, and that which is acted upon. That which is acted upon is unqualified substance, i.e. matter; that which acts is the reason (logos) in it, i.e. god.

Understood in this way, Chrysippus’s view seems to share certain features with those more contemporary epistemologists who are keen to emphasize the proper function of one’s cognitive abilities—more so than one’s subjective relationship to a belief—in the production of beliefs that meet the requirements for warrant or knowledge. The Stoics saw the presence of the divine in terrestrial things. The epistemic faculties, like other faculties, are there for a reason.

4. Logic

The Stoics’ appreciation for logic probably originated with the school’s founder. Zeno studied with Stilpo the Megarian. And Megara was the home of a number of important philosophers engaging in a discipline that we would today call logic. Chrysippus, without question, is the philosopher most responsible for the logic associated with the Stoics. In the following section, we will consider some of the elements that set his logic apart from that of his predecessors, as well as the propositional logic that most students of philosophy are familiar with today.

a. Arguments

One way of understanding Chrysippus’ contribution to logic is to see what Stoic arguments are not. Consider the following argument:

All mammals are warm-blooded animals.
All warm-blooded animals are sanguineous.
So: All mammals are sanguineous.

Aristotle called an argument of this variety a syllogism. He took it as evident that given the truth of the premises, the conclusion is likewise true. Indeed, one need not know the meaning of the terms in the argument to determine that the conclusion follows logically from the premises. One may simply consider the form of the argument:

All A are B A = mammals
All B are C B = warm-blooded animals
So: All A are C C = sanguineous

Logicians consider arguments wherein the conclusion follows from the premises, in just this way, to be valid. It is important to recognize that an argument’s having true premises provides neither necessary nor sufficient grounds for it to be valid. The following argument is valid, as the conclusion follows from the premises, even though the premises would rightly be resisted. The argument thereafter has true premises, but it is clearly invalid, as the premises may be true although the conclusion is false.

All trout are mammals. No viviparous animal is a trout.
All mammals are oviparous. No trout is a mammal.
So: All trout are oviparous. So: No viviparous animal is a mammal.

Consider, next, the following argument. It is clearly valid, but how would one fit it into an Aristotelian syllogism?

If Plato walks, then Plato moves. p = Plato walks.
Plato walks. q = Plato moves.
So: Plato moves.

Aristotle resisted the idea that there could be a scientific demonstration that concerned individuals. (Notice that the Aristotelian arguments above made use of classes). The argument currently under discussion resists an Aristotelian formulation, for the relata herein are propositions—Stoics called these ‘sayables’—rather than classes. In Aristotelian logic, the key connectives are ‘all’, ‘some’, ‘is’, and ‘is not’. In Chrysippus’ logic, the key connectives are ‘if’, ‘or’, ‘and’, and ‘not’. In the forms below, the former represents the form of our argument above; the latter a form that is clearly fallacious:

If p, then q If p, then q p = Plato walks.
p q q = Plato moves.
So: q So: p

Stoics built arguments in this way. Following Aristotle’s lead in the Prior Analytics, they listed a number of indemonstrable modes of argument—forms whose validity is clearly not in question—to which, they were optimistic, all other valid arguments may be reduced. The following is a list of the five indemonstrable forms (the first four have names):

Modus ponens: If p, q; p; ergo, q.
Modus tollens: If p, q; not q; ergo, not p.
Modus ponendo tollens: Either p or q; p; ergo not q.
Modus tollendo ponens: Either p or q; not q; ergo p.
Not both p and q; p; ergo, not q.

b. Propositions

That the Stoics distinguished between simple and complex propositions should be clear from what has been said heretofore. The sayable Plato walks is simple, and the sayable If Plato walks, then Plato moves is complex, as the statements Plato walks and Plato moves are connected by the particles ‘if’ and ‘then’. But Chrysippus’s account of what makes complex ‘sayables’ true or false differs in interesting ways with the truth-functional accounts that many modern philosophers make use of (a sentence is truth-functional when the truth of the sentence is a function of the values of its subsentences). Consider ponendo tollens above and let the value of p be the car won’t start because of a dead battery, and the value of q be the car won’t start because of a bad alternator. When your mechanic asserts the disjunction of these claims, and subsequently finds the former to be true, an inference to the falsity of the latter is not deductively valid. (It might be that you have a bad alternator as well.) This is not the way that Chrysippus seems to have viewed the matter. The Stoics were keen to understand all legitimate disjunctions to present mutually exclusive alternatives, for example, p or q, but not both p and q:

But all the disjuncts must mutually conflict, and their contradictories…must also be mutually opposed. Of all disjuncts, one must be true, the other false. But if neither of them is true, or all or more than one of them are true, or the disjuncts do not conflict, or the contradictories of the disjuncts are not incompatible, then that is false as a disjunctive proposition (LS 301).

For Chrysippus the paradigmatically true conditional is one where the contradictory of the consequent conflicts with the antecedent. In the conditional below, the contradictory of the consequent is Plato does not move. And this claim can reasonably be said to be in conflict with our antecedent: Plato walks.

If (antecedent) Plato walks, then (consequent) Plato moves.

And although there is no detailed or precise account of how Chrysippus understood this notion of conflict, it is likely the case that the conflict in question is of the conceptual variety rather than mere empirical incompatibility (See LS 211). The type of conditional in question can be contrasted with the material conditional of the propositional calculus favored by many modern logicians, where a conditional is true provided the antecedent is false or the consequent is true (or is understood inclusively here). Consider the claim If we have pie, then we will have coffee. The contradictory of our consequent is We will not have coffee, and this claim does not present any real conflict with the antecedent of our claim, namely, We will have pie. Furthermore, a conditional of the material variety is truth-functional, that is, true just by virtue of the truth of its constituents. (The Stoics preferred to express claims of this sort as ‘it is not the case that we will have pie and not have coffee’.) Notice how a Chrysippean conditional, mutatis mutandis a Chrysippean disjunction, depends upon more than the truth-value of its constituents. Not only does it depend upon the contradictory of the consequent, it depends as well on a semantic understanding of what it is to conflict.

c. Modality

As we saw above, the Stoics classified certain kinds of sayables with reference to certain properties that are not part of linguistic form. In addition, Stoics classified sayables in terms of their modal properties, that is, possibility, necessity, impossibility, and non-necessity. (They also considered the properties of plausibility and probability as well (Bobzien 2003). For the Stoics’ account of modality, the Megarians are again an important influence (LS 231):

Diodorus defines the possible as ‘what is or will be’; the impossible as ‘what, being false, will not be true’; the necessary as ‘what being true, will not be false’; and the non-necessary as ‘what either is now, or will be false’.

An account such as this one fixes the possible to the temporal. If something is possible, say a sea-battle, then it occurs at some time. If something is impossible, say a triangle with less than three sides, then there will not be an instance of it at some time. The necessary sayable, for example, triangles have fewer than four sides, is that which will not be false at some time. And the non-necessary, Cypselus is ruling, is a claim that will be false at some time. One difficulty that accounts such as this face is that they do not explain sentences such as the following:

A golden mountain is at the top of Hannah Street.

This coat might have been shredded, but it was burned instead.

Sometimes we express a possibility that we believe will never actualize. Chrysippus offers a criticism similar in kind. He seems to argue that a jewel might never be smashed, but that insofar as one might receive credit for not smashing it, we would nevertheless consider it possible to smash the jewel (LS 235).

The set of modal definitions preferred by the Stoics is difficult to reconstruct. But there is some reason for thinking that Chyrsippus followed Philo in taking possible propositions to be those wherein the internal nature is capable of truth. Precisely what one is to make of the locution ‘internal nature is capable of truth’ is not known. But it is tempting to understand Chrysippus on the basis of his objections to Diodorus, and his account of conditionals, as saying something akin to “a proposition is possible if conceptually self-consistent, and (if) there are no external circumstances preventing it”. The remaining modalities would be defined in relation to the possible.

5. Metaphysics

For reasons similar to those of the Epicureans, the Stoics were materialists. Only that which can affect or be affected may be said to exist, so the argument runs; and only that which is corporeal may affect or be affected (Academica I.39). Nevertheless, their view does admit of a kind of dualism, as everything in the cosmos is the result of an active principle, namely God, upon a passive, or causally inert, indeterminate substrate (Lives VII.134). And for Chrysippus, divine presence in terrestrial things comes in the form of pneuma–a fiery kind of air, or ether (Lives 7.138-9), which gives form and quality to that which is per se devoid of quality. Although the Epicureans, following in the tradition of Democritus and Leucippus, were arguing that everything is made up of the discrete and the indivisible (atomon), the Stoics maintained that the prima materia upon which the active principle exercised its influence is continuous, serving as the substrate for everything from basic continua such as earth, water, air, and fire, to individual organisms such as Socrates and Secretariat. Where the Peripatetic would characterize Secretariat as an individual substance or thing, and brown as a property, or modification, thereof; Chrysippus, and the Stoics in general, would consider Secretariat to be a property or modification of the passive element, and the brown color to be, in turn, a disposition thereof.

a. Ontology

As Simplicius reports in his commentary on Aristotle’s Categories (SVF 2.369):

The Stoics see fit to reduce the number of primary genera, and others they take over with changes in the reduced list. For they make their division a fourfold one, into substrates, the qualified, the disposed, and the relatively disposed.

Thus, the Stoics recognized four main levels of existence, and, as Long and Sedley have argued, there is some reason for thinking that these categories originated with Chrysippus (165). The first category is that of substrate (hupokeimenon). To locate an entity in this first category is to assign it existence without reference to its qualities. This characterless substance is being, or ousia, in its primary sense. The next level of being is that of quality. To be more precise, this level of being is something qualified by the inseparable god, reason, or soul, that pervades the substrate, and on the account of Chrysippus, this takes the form of pneuma (LS 46A). In the second category the Stoics placed modifications or qualified substrates (poia) of the prima materia and, interestingly, it is in this category of qualities, or poia, that the Stoics include people, and organisms, in general. Organisms are, therefore in an important sense, adjectival in being. The third category concerns dispositions of the things that are qualified, or things that are qualified, disposed in some way (põs echonta). Grammatical knowledge, for example, would be a disposition of the grammarian. In the fourth category, the Stoics countenanced dispositions that are relatively so, or pros ti põs echonta. These dispositions bear a resemblance to the so called Cambridge properties that may change without any change to the item under consideration, as, for example, your being to the right of me may occur without my having changed my position.

b. Being, Being Something, and the Nature of Properties

The Stoics were, moreover, materialists. Only corporeals, or somata, exist. Existence, however, is not the highest ontological category. In the Sophist, Plato had suggested that for something x to be some thing was for x to exist. But the Stoics reject Plato’s suggestion, maintaining that reality may be divided on the one hand into corporeals (somata), which may be said to exist; and on the other hand into incorporeals (asomata), which may be said to subsist (SVF 1.65). The Stoics thought that the latter category was comprised of such things as time, place, void, and ‘sayable’ (lekta). The Stoics’ reason for saying that the incoporeals are real has, to be sure, a Meinongian ring. In order to be an object of one’s thought, a lekta, for example, must be something. Otherwise there is nothing one is ex hypothesi thinking about.

Understood in this way, the Stoic ontological classification implicitly rules out properties of a certain kind. Socrates and Glaucon, for example, both have the attribute of being a man. And this invites the question: Does this so called entity Man, under which both are said to be classified, exist? Plato on the received view (but see Grabowski 2008), and Aristotle, held that (i) the property of being a man exists independently of our recognition thereof, and, (ii) that the property, that of being a man, which belongs to Socrates, is numerically identical to the property, similarly described, which belongs to Callias. Though the philosophical literature on properties is less than univocal, in terminology and criteria, those who accept the received view, attributed here to Plato and Aristotle, are frequently referred to as Realists. Those who maintain that properties described in this way do not exist are frequently called Nominalists.

Chrysippus resolutely rejects the views of Plato and Aristotle concerning properties. But the committed Nominalist will have to say something about propositions which are taken to be true, and which, importantly, seem to refer to such entities, call them for present purposes, universals. Consider the following proposition:

(A) Man is a rational mortal animal.

Chrysippus, as we will see below, relies upon the truth of this proposition in his ethical philosophy. The advocate of this proposition, however, would seem to be committed to the universal Man. In order to avoid this ontological commitment, Chrysippus understands the claim as conditional rather than existential in form (LS 301):

(A*) If something is a man, that thing is a rational mortal animal.

Although (A*), as one might argue, is identical in meaning to (A), (A*) does not make use of the abstract term Man, and if (A*) does not require the use of the abstract term Man, Chrysippus needn’t countenance any entity to which the term may refer in order to count (A*) to be true. And, since he takes the meaning of (A) and (A*) to be one and the same, he can take (A) to be true as well. Of course, there are propositions in addition to (A) that one might consider orthodox, which seem to make reference to abstract entities. Chrysippus is optimistic that a similar kind of paraphrase will apply, mutatis mutandis, to these.

Having argued that one need not posit the existence of universals to account for certain propositions of the orthodox variety, Chrysippus developed an argument in support of the claim that the Platonic account is unintelligible (LS 30 E):

Indeed, Chrysippus too raises problems as to whether the Idea will be called a certain this (tode ti)…Namely: if someone is in Athens, he is not in Megara; <but man is in Athens; therefore man is not in Megara>. For man is not someone, since the universal is not someone; but we took him as someone in the argument. And that is why the argument has this name, being called the ‘Not-someone’ argument.

The argument is a little impressionistic, but we might begin to reconstruct it as follows:

(1) If someone (or something) is in Athens, he (or it) is not in Megara.
(2) Man is in Athens.
So: (3) Man is not in Megara.

The argument seems to be a reductio ad absurdum built upon the idea that the Platonist will accept claims (1) and (2). The acceptance of (1) and (2), however, with an application of modus ponens, entails something the Platonist will not willingly accept. At this point, the Platonist might feel pushed to claim that Man is not to be classified by the terms, that is, someone or something, in the first premise. This, however, comes dangerously close to conceding a point to which the Platonist is not entitled, that is, Man is not something. Perhaps a more appealing move for the Platonist would be to give up (1) maintaining that universals are something, and that they are things that may be found in objects that are in different places, such as Athens and Megara, at the same time. This of course flushes out the very queer nature of universals. It seems that countenancing universals countenances entities that may be located simultaneously in a number of places, if they are located at all. It is, of course, open to the Platonist to argue that the properties in question do not exist in space, so it is a mistake to say that they are ‘located’ in a number of places at the same time.

c. The Growing Argument

As Long and Sedley argue, the fourfold ontological distinction seems to have emerged in response to Academic criticism, and Chrysippus seems to have been the central respondent (172). The Academics had made use of an argument known as the Growing Argument, which is traced to the fifth-century comic poet named Epicharmus, in order to generate skepticism with respect to the idea that an organism may endure, or exist diachronically (LS 28A). The argument begins by making use of an analogy that may be adapted to suit our purposes as follows: Suppose that I have a stack of pennies in my garage on Tuesday, and I remove one of the pennies on Wednesday. The resultant stack of pennies in my garage is, arguably, not the same stack that was in my garage on Tuesday, but a new stack altogether. To drive the idea home, we might suppose that the stack is not composed, as it were, of pennies, but rather of fifty dollar bills. Suppose I promise Helena, on Tuesday, that she may have the stack of bills provided that she cleans the garage. Were I to remove one of the fifties before giving her the stack, she can fairly protest that I did not give her the same stack I had promised her. The moral to glean, then, is that when it comes to stacks or lumps, the removal (or addition) of one (or more) of the constituents results in the destruction of the old (or the generation of a new) lump or stack. As the Academics were inclined to point out, on the Stoic view, people are composed entirely of matter. And who can deny that in, say, drinking a cup of coffee, or a glass of wine, there is an influx (and later there will be an efflux) of material constituents? What is more, work central to Stoic cosmology involved the study of natural processes. Where growth and decay are among the most fundamental of these, the Academics challenged the idea that any coherent account may here be provided (Sedley 1982, 258).

Those who are familiar with John Locke’s treatment of diachronic identity, in The Essay Concerning Human Understanding, will spot a certain resemblance in Chrysippus’s response. For Chrysippus seems to believe that a single object may, under different descriptions, have incompatible properties ascribed thereto (Sedley 1982, 259). Under the description ‘this lump of matter’, one’s identity may change continually from one moment to the next. Under the description ‘this person’, this need not be the case. For Chrysippus, moreover, a thing’s constitutive matter is a hupokeimenon. And, as a substrate, as Chrysippus concedes, things do not exist diachronically. Nevertheless, lumps of matter possess unique sets of qualities, and may be classified under the second category of the Stoic ontology. These items can be said to be idiõs poioi, ‘peculiarly qualifieds’, which can indeed endure through time. It is in this way that living things are said to exist diachronically.

Having disarmed the Growing Argument in this way, Chrysippus seems to have taken his case on the offensive. The text we have to work with derives from Philo of Alexandria:

Chrysippus, the most distinguished member of their school, in his work On the Growing Argument, creates a freak of the following kind. Having first established that it is possible for two peculiarly qualified individuals to occupy the same substance jointly, he says: “For the sake of argument, let one individual be thought of as whole-limbed; the other as minus one foot. Let the whole-limbed one be called Dion, the defective one Theon. Then let one of Dion’s feet be amputated…”

Chrysippus’ thought-experiment here bears a striking resemblance to a more modern puzzle that has been discussed by David Wiggins (1968): consider a cat by the name of Tibbles, and focus for the moment on that portion of Tibbles that includes everything save Tibbles tale. Designate the portion that includes everything but Tibbles’ tale with the name Tib. Tibbles and Tib, heretofore, do not occupy the same space at the same time. Thus, Tibbles and Tib are not identical. Suppose, however, that we amputate Tibbles’ tale. Tibbles and Tib now occupy the same region of space. If Tibbles is still a cat, it will be difficult to discern a criterion by which one could deny that Tib is a cat. Nevertheless, Tibbles and Tib are distinct individuals as they have had different histories. Hence, two cats occupy, and of course don’t occupy (so runs the reductio), the same place. And the puzzle, for Wiggins, is to see where the reasoning has gone astray. Chrysippus’ puzzle is very similar: Dion and Theon are said to occupy the same substance (rather than the same space), and where Dion has a right foot, Theon lacks one. However, when Dion’s foot is amputated, Chrysippus’s approach is not that of considering the conclusion to be validly derived from faulty premises. Instead, Chrysippus rejects the idea that Theon continues to exist. By all appearances, Chrysippus seems to have argued that after the amputation, when a bystander poses the question ‘Whose foot has been severed?’ the only intelligible answer is: that of Dion. As Theon could not have lost a foot he never had, and whoever is being bandaged there just lost a foot, Dion is the better candidate for survival. Of course, the paradox cannot be said to be constructed on Stoic premises. Sedley argues that Chrysippus turns the Growing Argument back on the Academics by showing that although they assume that material growth and diminution are fatal to the idea of an enduring entity, diminution is indeed part of the condition of Dion’s enduring, while the undiminished, unchanged Theon is the one who perishes (1982, 270).

d. Freedom and Necessity

Providence plays the leading role in Stoic cosmology. An instance of causation is, after all, the operation of the active principle, namely god, on that which is passive or inert. This providence gives way, for Chrysippus, to an outlook on the cosmos that is very deterministic (SVF2.1000).

In On Providence book 4, Chrysippus says that fate is a certain natural, everlasting ordering of the whole: one set of things follows and succeeds another, and the interconnection is inviolable.

Chrysippus’s deterministic outlook invites the following question: If the cosmos is ordered in a deterministic fashion, and we are part of it, then it would seem that we are ordered in a deterministic fashion. Thus, our actions will follow the one upon the other in a succession where the nexus is never violable. And, if we may never deviate from the course ordered by fate, we never have the control to act otherwise. Chrysippus’s cosmology seems not to accommodate the view that we are sometimes morally responsible for our actions. Stoic philosophy is, however, a philosophy of moral rigor, so Chrysippus owes an answer. Epicurean philosophers maintained a minimal level of indeterminacy at the atomic level (De Rerum Natura 2.216). As we have seen, this option is not open to Chrysippus and, in any case, the indeterminacy view is not without difficulty. (As Hume argued in the Enquiry, one has no control over that which lacks a cause). The acceptance of determinism taken with an optimistic outlook concerning the possibility of free action suggests that Chrysippus countenances the latter as compatible with the former. Precisely how the two are going to be understood as compatible has, however, been the subject of some controversy.

One possibility for understanding Chrysippus’ view can be derived from the following text (Long and Sedley 62a):

They too [Zeno and Chrysippus] affirmed that everything is fated, with the following model: When a dog is tied to a cart, if it wants to follow it is pulled and follows, making its spontaneous act coincide with necessity, but if it does not want to follow it will be compelled in any case. So it is with men too: even if they do not want to, they will be compelled in any case to follow what is destined.

This passage has been interpreted in a variety of ways. One might understand the point to be as follows. The threat that fatalism or determinism poses for moral responsibility seems to enter with the idea that if we cannot act otherwise than we do, we are not free. But consider our dog Maddy, fettered as she is to her master’s cart. We may assume that she follows her master, who is pulling the cart, with a canine sense of alacrity, and that she would do so, in much the same way, even were she not tied to the cart. It seems that she freely follows her master when, nevertheless, she could not act otherwise. Read in this way, the passage is a counterexample to the claim that if one cannot act otherwise, one is not free.

Susanne Bobzien has argued that the simile was authored by neither Zeno nor Chrysippus, but instead has its source in the Roman Stoa, and although she does acknowledge that it is probably an interpretation of a number of verses belonging to Cleanthes (2001 354), she finds nothing in the passage that meets up with accommodating free will. The point of the passage, on her view, is simply that it is in vain that one revolts from what fate administers.

Another important passage for exegetes is the following:

For although assent cannot occur unless it is prompted by an impression, nevertheless, since it has that impression as its proximate, not its primary cause, Chrysippus wants it to have the rationale which I mentioned just now. He does not want assent, at least, to be able to occur without the stimulus of external force (for assent must be prompted by an impression). But he resorts to his cylinder and spinning-top; these cannot begin to move without a push; but once that has happened, he holds that it is thereafter through their own nature that the cylinder rolls and the top spins. “Hence”, he says, “just as the person who pushed the cylinder gave it its beginning of motion but not its capacity for rolling, likewise, although the impression encountered will print and, as it were, emblazon its appearance on the mind, assent will be in our power. And assent, just as we said in the case of the cylinder, although prompted from will, thereafter moves through its own force”.

The above passage is important in connection with Chrysippus’s epistemology, meeting up as it does with the issue of whether belief or acceptance is a voluntary process. But it may also hold a clue concerning Chrysippus’ account of free action in general. The idea seems to be that the cylinder needs to be pushed in order to be set in motion, and considerations of the Newtonian variety aside, the power to keep rolling is specific to its nature. And, just as the power to keep rolling is found in the nature of the cylinder, so too the power of assent or dissent issues from the agent’s power. Of course, one might object that one may have little to no control over the dispositions that drive one to assent or dissent. And, if one doesn’t haven’t any control over certain antecedent events, that necessitate certain other events, then it seems that one doesn’t have any control over the subsequent events either. That this latter claim is true is not obvious however (McKay and Johnson 1996): Suppose with fair dice I roll snake eyes. From this fact, it follows by necessity that I am playing dice. But does it follow that my playing dice was not up to me? I certainly cannot roll snake eyes without playing dice. But is my playing dice necessitated in the same way? Perhaps the way is unimpeded for Chrysippus to make use of a similar kind of reasoning in his account of free action.

6. Ethics

a. Eudaimonism

As Aristotle observed, although most people agree that happiness or eudaimonia is the goal of life, there is less agreement concerning just what happiness consists in (1095a17). The Stoics agree with Aristotle that living a happy life is the end for the sake of which all things are done, and that such an activity is not done for the sake of anything else (SVF 3.16). Having set eudaimonia or eu zên as the summum bonum, the Stoics are left with the task of indicating wherein happiness consists. And, for the Stoics, happiness consists in nothing other than virtue (De Finibus III.44):

We deem health to be deserving of a certain value, but we do not reckon it a good; at the same time we rate no value so highly as to place it above virtue. This is not the same view held by the Peripatetics, who are going to say that an action which is both moral (honesta) and without pain is more desirable than the same action with pain. We [Stoics] think otherwise.

Nothing, then, is valued more than virtue. One might take happiness to be of a higher value than virtue, as the former may be thought of as a means to the latter, but this would be a mistake, for it seems that Chrysippus was willing to simply identify the virtuous life and the happy life (LS 63h):

He (Chrysippus) maintains that vice is the essence of unhappiness, insisting in every book that he writes on ethics and physics that living viciously is identical to living unhappily.

Of course, in identifying happiness with virtue, Chrysippus is obligated to provide an account of virtue. Zeno, the founder of the school at the Stoa Poikilê, had maintained that the final end of life was to live consistently and harmoniously (SVFI.79). His successor, Cleanthes, understood living consistently and harmoniously as living consistently with nature (SVF3.12.) Chrysippus further explicated the idea with the following formulation: “To live in accordance with one’s experience of the things which come about by nature” (SVF1.12). But it is still unclear what living in accordance with nature means. Friedrich Nietzsche, a German philosopher of the 19th century, attempted to parody the idea by saying:

According to nature you want to live? O you noble Stoics, what deceptive words these are…And supposing your imperative, “live according to nature,” meant at bottom as much as “living according to life”—how could you not do that? Why make a principle out of what you yourselves are and must be?

As we have seen, a fairly thorough determinism pervades the thought of the Stoics, and the course to understanding Chrysippus’s views on action is not without difficulty. So one might fairly ask the question: How might one not live according to nature? In order to understand what the Stoics have in mind, it is important to note that a recurring debate among philosophical circles in antiquity concerned whether what is good is so in virtue of nature (physis) or convention (nomos). As Aristotle points out in the Nichomachean Ethics, there is such diversity among opinions concerning which actions are just that they are thought to exist according to convention rather than nature (1094b 14-16). So, living in conformity with nature or with what is good by nature, contrasts with living in accordance with mere opinion, or convention, concerning what is good. Now, when Chrysippus says, one ought to live in accordance with one’s experience of the things which come about by nature, there is some reason for thinking the nature he has in mind is the nature that is peculiar to human beings. The proprium or nature of the human species is the use of reason. So it seems that Chrysippus’s position is that the man who lives in accordance with reason lives in accordance with virtue. This is a position that enjoys some popularity and that rings reminiscent of Aristotle’s in Nichomachean Ethics. The problem of accounting for free action has not, thus, been cleared away. Nor has the gap between is and ought, hereby, closed. But the imperative ‘live according to nature’ may simply mean ‘live according to your nature qua human being by living in accordance with reason’. And, as an account of virtue, this view had a few considerations in its favor.

b. The Unity of Virtues

Although Chrysippus’s views on virtue share a great deal with those of Aristotle, another clear similarity concerns the connections that Chrysippus and Socrates found to obtain among the cardinal virtues. Socrates seems to have thought that virtues may be reduced to one thing (Protagoras 361a-b), namely, the ability to discern good from evil. In the Laches, for example, it is suggested that courage may be reduced to wisdom by arguing that courage is the knowledge of what inspires fear and confidence. That which issues in fear is evil, and that which inspires confidence is good. Courage is, so the argument goes, knowledge of what is good and what is evil (198b2-199e). Arguments similar in kind reduce the other virtues to knowledge of good and evil, and Chrysippus seems to have retained Socrates’s line of thinking. Prudence is the knowledge of things to be chosen; temperance is the knowledge, for example, of that for which one must be resolute (SVF3.95). Of course, understanding virtue as reducible, in some way, to knowledge dovetails nicely with the idea that virtue is living in accordance with reason.

It is usually thought that the source of knowledge requisite for virtue, according to Chrysippus, is the study of natural philosophy. However, in recent years there has been some debate concerning whether or not the science of ethics, according to Zeno, Cleanthes, and Chrysippus depends crucially upon claims about the nature of the cosmos. A number of scholars now believe that the founders of Stoic philosophy should be freed from the interpretation that ethics relies heavily upon a cosmology that is un- controversially providential. Julia Annas, for example, finds it hard to swallow the idea that ethics depends on cosmology as it “…lead[s] us…to accept counterintuitive conclusions such as nothing but vice is bad, and that emotions like regret are all mistaken”. Accepting the view, however, that the Stoics did not think ethics inextricably tied to physics has its own set of counterintuitive consequences, for it becomes difficult to take them at their word in more than a few key texts. The following is taken from Plutarch (admittedly not the most charitable reader of Stoicism), from his De Stoicorum Repugnantis (LS 60A):

Again in his Physical Postulates, [Chrysippus] says, “There is no other or more appropriate way of approaching the theory of good and bad things or the virtues or happiness than from universal nature (koinê physis), and from the administration of the world”. And later: “For the theory of good and bad, things must be attached to these, since there in no other starting point or reference for them that is better, and physical speculation (physika theoria) is to be adopted for no other purpose than for the differentiation of good and bad things”.

A straightforward reading of Plutarch’s quotation here—this is the reading, for example, of Long and Sedley (LS 374)—is that an account of the rational and providential features of god, which pervade the natural world, are indispensable when determining that which constitutes the good of man. Read in this way, Chrysippus comes across as a teleologist countenancing the good, the scientific, and the pious lives to be one and the same.

7. References and Further Reading

The following lists some important work that has been done on Chrysippus and Stoic philosophy. It is not intended to be a comprehensive bibliography.

a. Primary Sources

  • Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta in Four Volumes (Leipzig: Teubner, 1903-1924)
    • This work, originally compiled by Hans von Arnim, consisted of three volumes of testimonia and fragments intended for individuals with a background in Latin and Greek literature. Volume one contains fragments relating to Zeno and his followers. Volume two contains fragments related to Chrysippus’s logical and natural philosophy. The third volume contains material related to Chrysippus’s ethical philosophy. A fourth volume containing general indices was added in 1924 by Maximillian Adler.
  • The Hellenistic philosophers, Volume 1: Translations of the Principal Sources, with Philo-Sophical Commentary, by A.A. Long and D.N. Sedley, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
    • This work is probably indispensable for anyone interested in Hellenistic philosophy. It contains English translations and astute commentary. An accompanying volume contains the Greek and Latin texts from which the translations are derived.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Josiah B. Gould, The Philosophy of Chrysippus, Albany, SUNY Press, 1970.
    • This is one of the few monographs limited to discerning the thought of Chrysippus. It is a common starting point for exegetes interested in Chrysippus’s influence on Stoicism.
  • Susanne Bobzien, Determinism and Freedom in Stoic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001.
    • Although this work treats the issue of free action in Stoic thought in general, there is a great deal that focuses upon Chrysippus’s views specifically. A number of other articles by Bobzien, including the following, will also be rewarding:
  • Susanne Bobzien, ‘Chrysippus and the Epistemic Theory of Vagueness’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 102 (2002), 217-38.
  • Susanne Bobzien,‘Chrysippus’s Theory of Causes’, Topics in Stoic Philosophy, ed. K. Ierodiakonou, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999, 196-242.
  • Susanne Bobzien, ‘Logic’, Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, ed. Brad Inwood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003, 85-123.
  • J. Bowin, ‘Chrysippus’s Puzzle about Identity’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 24 (2003), 239-251.
  • God and Cosmos in Stoicism, ed. Ricardo Salles Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • Readers interested in questions concerning nature, and how humans fit therein, will find a number of interesting essays in God and Cosmos. Recent interest in how humans fit into the environment has issued an interest in the Stoic conception of how humans fit into nature. Several of the essays in this work treat primarily Chrysippus’s views.

c. Other References

  • Annas, J. ‘Ethics in Stoic Philosophy’, Phronesis, 52, 58-87.
  • Caston, V. ‘Something and Nothing: The Stoics on Concepts and Universals’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 17, 145-213.
  • Grabowski, F. Plato, Metaphysics and the Forms. Continuum Studies in Ancient Philosophy, New York/London: Continuum, 2008.
  • McKay, Thomas and David Johnson (1996). “A Reconsideration of an Argument against Compatibilism”, Philosophical Topics 24: 113-122.
  • Nietzsche, F. Beyond Good and Evil, in Basic Writings of Nietzsche, tr. and ed. Walter Kaufmann, New York: Modern Library, 1992: 205.

Author Information

Jeremy Kirby
Albion College
U. S. A.

Diogenes of Apollonia (5th cn. B.C.E.)

Diogenes of Apollonia is often considered to be the last of the Presocratic Greek philosophers, although it is more than likely that Democritus was still active after the death of Diogenes. Diogenes’ main importance in the history of philosophy is that he synthesized the earlier Ionic monism of Anaximenes and Heraclitus with the pluralism of Empedocles and Anaxagoras. Diogenes serves as a sort of culminating point for Presocratic philosophy, uniting its differing tendencies toward emphasizing the absolute indivisibility or identity of reality with the equally absolute multiplicity of differing beings. Just as for Heraclitus, the truth for Diogenes was that one self-identical thing is all different things. By abiding by the Presocratic natural law that out of nothing comes nothing and into nothing, nothing goes, Diogenes proposed a definition of nature that identified it with life and explicitly affirmed that it is generated from itself. Diogenes’ main idea was that nature, the entire universe, is an indivisibly infinite, eternally living, and continuously moving substance he called, following Anaximenes, air. All the natural changes occurring throughout the universe—the various forms, the incalculable multiplicity the singular being takes—are one substance, air, under various modes. Air is also intelligent. Indeed, air is intelligence, or noesis in the Ancient Greek. Noesis is the purely intuitive, rational thinking that expresses and sustains all cosmic processes. As the self-causal power of rational, intuitive intelligence, air is also a god. When defining air solely as an atmospheric condition, as we do today, and in relation to the three other main elements, namely, fire, water, and earth, Diogenes’ air becomes the soul of singular beings. The soul is the source of every living thing’s sensitive ability to live, know, and thus also affect and be affected by other singular beings. The soul is also the way the absolute cosmic air identifies itself through a number of living differentiations as the means by which living creatures exhibit their differing degrees of temperature and density.  Through the soul, air is sometimes rarer or more condensed, and likewise sometimes hotter or cooler. The soul is the life-principle that, when mixed with and operating through other aerated forms like blood and veins, allows for the living functions of all singular beings to remain self-sustaining until the necessary process of decomposition affects them. Such decomposition, however, is just another means for nature’s processes to continue to function insofar as each decomposed being is the simultaneous site for the next modification that air will engender and express through itself. Ultimately, for Diogenes, the essence of all reality, identified as intelligent and divine air, is that it is both nature and life, as nature and life are identical as one absolute substance.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Substance Monism
  3. Air
  4. Intelligence and Divinity
  5. Cosmology and Physiology
  6. Influence and Historical Role
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

The exact chronology of the life of Diogenes of Apollonia is unknown, but most accounts place the date of his acme somewhere around 460-430 BCE.  It was once believed that he was from the Cretan city of Apollonia, but it is now thought that the Apollonia of which he was a citizen was the Milesian colony on the Pontus that was actually founded by the Presocratic philosopher Anaximander, and which is today the Bulgarian Black Sea resort town of Sozopol. It is also thought Diogenes lived for some time in Athens and that while there, he became so unpopular (being thought an atheist) that his life was in danger. Further proof of Diogenes’ probable residence in Athens is the parody we find of him in Aristophanes’ The Clouds, even though it is Socrates who is portrayed as holding Diogenes’ views. Diogenes Laertius writes, “Diogenes, son of Apollothemis, an Apolloniate, a physicist and a man of exceptional repute. He was a pupil of Anaximenes, as Antisthenes says. His period was that of Anaxagoras” (IX, 57). Theophrastus also mentions that Diogenes of Apollonia was ‘almost the youngest’ of the physical philosophers. It has been persuasively put forward that Diogenes Laertius was more than likely confused when he wrote that Diogenes of Apollonia was a pupil of Anaximenes, considering the agreed upon earliness and geographic location of Diogenes by most commentators. Like Anaximenes, however, Diogenes held that the fundamental substance of nature is air, but it is highly unlikely he could have studied with him. On the other hand, the view that Diogenes flourished in roughly the same period as Anaxagoras is uncontroversial.

There has been much debate over whether Diogenes wrote a single book or even as many as four. Only fragments of Diogenes’ work survive. A majority of the fragments that we have of Diogenes’ work come from Simplicius’ commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics and On the Heavens. Simplicius writes,

Since the generality of enquirers say that Diogenes of Apollonia made air the primary element, similarly to Anaximenes, while Nicolaus in his theological investigation relates that Diogenes declared the material principle to be between fire and air…, it must be realized that several books were written by this Diogenes (as he himself mentioned in On Nature, where he says that he had spoken also against the physicists—whom he calls ‘sophists’—and written a Meteorology, in which he also says he spoke about the material principle, as well as On the Nature of Man); in the On Nature, at least, which alone of his works came into my hands, he proposes a manifold demonstration that in the material principle posited by him is much intelligence. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 435)

The debate is over whether On Nature is the one book that Diogenes wrote and which covered many different yet nevertheless interrelated topics (such as man, meteorology, and the Sophists), or that On Nature, On the Nature of Man, Meteorologia, and Against the Sophists were four separate works. Diels, the early German collator of the Presocratic fragments, preferred the former option (DK 64B9), while commentators like Burnet (EGP 353) prefer the latter view. It also entirely possible that Simplicius was either confused or misinformed in his reading of Diogenes because of the fact that the quotations of Diogenes’ work, which he himself provides, contain discussions, for example, on the nature of man, which should have been impossible if indeed he only had a copy of On Nature in his possession. At the same time, we have evidence from a work of the medical author Galen that a certain Diogenes wrote a treatise that dealt with a number of diseases and their causes and remedies. It is probable that this was Diogenes of Apollonia because we have other reports from Galen (and Theophrastus) that Diogenes held views about diagnosing a patient by analyzing his tongue and general complexion. This evidence, along with his discussions regarding anatomy and the function of veins, leads to the probability that Diogenes was a professional doctor of some sort who could have produced a technical medical treatise. Another interesting piece of evidence that suggests Diogenes could have been a doctor is the methodological claim he makes regarding his own form of writing, and which sounds very similar to what is said in the beginning of some of the more philosophical works in the Hippocratic corpus. Diogenes Laertius says that this was the first line of Diogenes’ book: “It is my opinion that the author, at the beginning of any account, should make his principle or starting-point indisputable, and his explanation simple and dignified” (Fr. 1).  Such a no-nonsense approach to writing was often championed by the early medical thinkers.

2. Substance Monism

Following his own recommendation that an author should clearly state his purpose up front, Diogenes began his account of nature by explicitly establishing his principle, or starting-point.  He writes:

My opinion, in sum, is that all existing things are differentiated from the same thing, and are the same thing. And this is manifest: for if the things that exist at present in this world-order—earth and water and air and fire and all the other things apparent in this world-order—if any of these were different from the other (different, that is, in its own proper nature), and did not retain an essential identity while undergoing many changes and differentiations, it would be in no way possible for them to mix with each other, or for one to help or harm the other, or for a growing plant to grow out of the earth or for a living creature or anything else to come into being, unless they were so composed as to be the same thing.  But all these things, being differentiated from the same thing, become different kinds at different times and return into the same thing. (Fr. 2)

Diogenes was what we today call a ‘substance monist’.  Substance monism is the idea that everything is one thing. In other words, it means that all putative different things essentially are one self-identical thing. Substance Monism is an answer to the question, ‘what is and how many are there? According to Diogenes, for anything to be it must paradoxically be both identical to and different from the one, the thing that is - the one substance that is everything. The differences, however, of things from the one thing that is, are never ‘proper,’ as Diogenes argues. That is to say, the differences of things are never substantial, but rather they are only adjectival differences.

Now, while we do not find the term ‘substance’ in the fragments we have of Diogenes’ writing, the idea of a substance, and, moreover, the idea of substance monism, can help us understand what Diogenes meant when he said ‘all existing things are differentiated from the same thing, and are the same thing.’ A substance is what a thing is. It is the basic being of a thing; the essential reality a thing has to have in order for it be what it is.  Things are substances if they essentially are the things they are. The essence of a substance is its own existence. This line of arguing was common to all the Presocratics because for them it was a natural law that out of nothing came nothing and into nothing, nothing went. To truly be, something had to be the essential source or cause of its own existence. Reality or being, therefore, for most of the Presocratics, and especially for Diogenes, is absolutely immanent to itself, and so all the differences there are in nature inhere in, or are internal to, it. This line of reasoning was an early version of what was to become the ontological argument. A Substance is a thing that exists because that is what it is: a thing that exists, a thing that exists on the basis of its own immanent self-sufficiency.

Diogenes was concerned with understanding what it is that makes a thing be what it is, what a thing’s substantial being is, and how many of these things or substances there really are. He wanted to know what makes a thing substantial. To understand what things are, what makes things be what they are, and how many of them there are, Diogenes simply observed both what he himself was composed of and what the primary qualities of everything he had ever experienced and thus thought about were. Like all the Presocratic philosophers, Diogenes’ chief observation was that all things are natural or physical. Diogenes observed that all things of this ‘present world-order’ are natural or physical elemental qualities such as earth, water, fire, and air. The observation that all things are natural or physical also implied that all things change, and that everything is moving in some degree, both growing and decaying, composing and decomposing, and speeding up and slowing down. For Diogenes, then, all things are physical and moving, for they are all natural and living. Therefore, the one self-identical substance that is in essence all different things is nature itself, which is the mobile, living, and absolutely physical identity of the universe. Furthermore, all the different things nature expresses of itself, or modifies via itself are variable forms of earth, water, fire, and air, which compose and decompose with each other in many ways as nature lives and moves. The elemental qualities of nature differ from each other only in degree and are in essence simply a variety of ways in which nature is identical to itself.

The observation that all things are physical, mobile, and different only in elemental degrees led Diogenes to note that if this is indeed the case then all things must be interrelated in some way. Relations, however, seem to demand some form of proper or substantial difference in order to occur. Diogenes was troubled by the apparent demands of proper duality implied by the living and flowing relations he observed as occurring throughout all of nature. The problem he had was that if all the things he observed relating throughout nature were really different from each other, then there was nothing in them or about them that made such relations even possible in the first place (for how could things truly relate that are really different from each other?) and thus, even more threateningly, everything he perceived as expressing a certain substantial identity was then utterly deceptive and false. In response to this dilemma, he noticed that if things relate in some degree, as they certainly seem to, there must be at least something they share, something in common between them that enables them to relate. That it is manifestly clear that things relate allowed Diogenes to assert the equally indubitable fact that there must be something between them they must all share that allows them to relate.  If things were so different from each other that either they could not relate at all or that their relations brought about only their total fragmentation or annihilation, nothing in nature could grow or move or become in any way radically contrary to what he observed as happening in nature. For this reason, Diogenes posited that there must be some one thing, some self-identical substance that allows all the naturally different things to interact, relate, and compose and decompose with each other. Without a fundamental substance implicitly and inherently linking all things together, nothing would have a common ground to share and work upon or a situational medium through which to change and grow. Therefore, there must be a thing that makes all things relatable, a thing that allows all things to be different from each other to some degree, yet still be connected enough to each other to allow them to interact and compose and decompose with each other. This thing, for Diogenes, was going to have to be every where, all the time because there was nowhere at any time that he did not observe natural bodies moving, growing, and relating.

Substance monism, therefore, served not only to explain the absolute immanence and essential self-identity of nature to itself, it also explained how all the kinds of living, growing, and interacting of singular beings occur throughout nature. By sharing the common substance they all modify, all the different things of nature, all the elemental and formal means of composing and decomposing could relate, interact, and help and harm each other through the infinite and eternal process of natural or physical growth and decay. In other words, for Diogenes and his kind of substance monism, being is becoming, nature is nurturing, and all forms of movement, work, creation, destruction, and causality are so many ways one self-identical substance naturally lives the life of all its self-differentiated forms. For Diogenes, substance monism entails that nature is life and that, in essence, the universe lives. One absolutely physical identity underwrites all the apparent diversity.

3. Air

Diogenes’ substance monism may seem radically opposed to what we believe today, especially with respect to our definitions of nature and life. Yet, even in Diogenes’ own time, his thinking was considered to be as peculiar and eclectic as that of many of the other Presocratics. Presocratic philosophy was often considered, in its own time and even today, to be neither religious nor scientific, but rather idiosyncratic and esoteric because of its emphasis on achieving the experience of a direct and immediate intuition of the essence of nature. Such an intuition defines the rarity and excellence of Presocratic wisdom. Like other Presocratics, Diogenes was a sage-like independent spirit who neither followed nor founded a school and who made use of the best elements of other philosophies he thought worthy of greater elaboration and which could yield him the wisdom he sought and loved. One such philosopher he borrowed from, as we mentioned, was Anaximenes. Like Anaximines, Diogenes maintained that air is the one substance of which everything is made, and is a mode of. In his Refutation of all Heresies, Hippolytus reports,

Anaximenes…said that infinite air was the principle, from which the things that are becoming, and that are, and that shall be, and gods and things divine, all come into being, and the rest from its products. The form of air is of this kind: whenever it is most equable, it is invisible to sight, but is revealed by the cold and the hot and the damp and by movement. It is always in motion; for things that change do not change unless there be movement. Through becoming denser or finer it has different appearances; for when it is dissolved into what is finer it becomes fire, while winds, again, are air that is becoming condensed, and cloud is produced from air by felting. When it is condensed still more, water is produced; with a further degree of condensation earth is produced, and when condensed as far as possible, stones. The result is that the most influential components of generation are opposites, hot and cold. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 145)

Diogenes agreed with Anaximenes and proposed that air is the one substance that is reality. Following Anaximenes, Diogenes argued that air is the essential identity of all different things and that all different things are just so many forms of condensed or rarefied air. Nature, as air, is an infinite and eternal process that, through its indivisible mobility and continuity, constantly becomes all the ways it comes to be and passes away through an absolute multiplicity of singular beings. All different things are momentarily denser or finer forms or modes of one ubiquitous air. Through Simplicius, Theophrastus tells us,

Diogenes the Apolloniate, almost the youngest of those who occupied themselves with these matters (that is, physical studies), wrote for the most part in an eclectic fashion, following Anaxagoras in some things and Leucippus in others. He, too, says that the substance of the universe is infinite and eternal air, from which, when it is condensed and rarefied and changed in its dispositions, the form of other things comes into being. This is what Theophrastus relates about Diogenes; and the book of Diogenes which has reached me, entitled On Nature, clearly says that air is that from which all the rest come into being. (Fr. 2)

Now, there is for us something obviously problematic about Diogenes’ thinking regarding air. The problem we have with trying to reconcile Diogenes’ thinking with what we know today is figuring out how ‘air’ can still be an absolutely cosmic, indivisibly infinite, and eternally living substance when it is limited to only the earth’s atmosphere. We understand air today to be reducible to other properties. To approach this problem it must first be understood what Diogenes meant by the term we are using. Aer in Ancient Greek was rooted in the verb ‘to blow, or breathe’ and the term often denoted a certain sense of loftiness and light, spirited movement.  Aer was also associated with the wind, the sky, and brightness. What Diogenes meant by air was the celerity and rapidity of the light and fluid movement of nature’s waxing and waning, its constant condensing and rarefying, its expanding and contracting. Air, for Diogenes, is the gaseous fluidity of all living and natural phenomena. It is important to understand that by ‘air’ Diogenes did not intend the grand total of all the substantially distinct atoms of oxygen, nitrogen, argon and so on that compose our atmosphere, but rather the simple fact that all things are natural, living, and moving. Air, for Diogenes, was both the constant stirring of the atmosphere as a singular elemental formation, and also all the ‘inhalations’ and ‘exhalations’ of the planetary and celestial movements. Air expresses the becoming of being, the living of nature. A mobile movement, a movement conceived not as the attribute or property of an immobile substance, but rather as a substance itself, movement itself conceived as substance, is what Diogenes understood by air. Air is the indivisible body that is the universe, all that is: “this very thing [air] is both eternal and immortal body, but of the rest some come into being, some pass away” (Fr. 7). And of the rest that come into being and pass away, they are all ways air modifies itself.  Atmospheric air is, therefore, another way absolute, substantial air (aer) becomes and expresses itself.

4. Intelligence and Divinity

Diogenes, moreover, says that air is intelligence. The Ancient Greek term for intelligence is noesis. Noesis is not just intelligence in the sense of being sharp or smart. What Diogenes designated by noesis was the active power of a mind to immediately intuit and know what it thinks. Noesis is not so much a belief held by a mind, as it is the activity of thinking itself that is a mind. A mind is an actively thinking thing. Now, we might be wondering how the absolute cosmic substance, air, could also have an immediately intuitive and active mind, that is, how it could also be a thinking thing. First, it is important to keep in mind that everything was physical for Diogenes. Thinking was a physical process for him that was not limited to only organisms with brains. (There will be more on this in the next section.) In other words, thinking did not solely mean cognition for Diogenes. Air is intelligence itself; pure thought intuitively thinking itself.  Just as all singular bodies are in air as modes or ways it modifies and transforms itself through condensation and rarefaction, so too are all minds, all intellects or intelligent beings, in air as modes or ideas through which it immediately intuits and thus thinks itself. If air is intelligence, or purely active thinking, and intelligence is thus the one indivisible body that imbues everything, then every singular body is also going to be imbued with mind. Second, Diogenes argued that intelligence was the power inherent to air with which it could absolutely and internally differentiate itself in a rational and measured fashion. We have already seen the four main elements of nature as an example of this rational and measured differentiation. Intelligence was for Diogenes a sufficient reason for all the differences of degree found throughout nature:

For, he [Diogenes] says, it would not be possible without intelligence for it [sc. the substance] so to be divided up that it has measures of all things—of winter and summer and night and day and rains and winds and fair weather. The other things, too, if one wishes to consider them, one would find disposed in the best possible way. (Fr. 3)

The intelligence and the soul, the thinking and the living of singular beings are modifications of substantial air-intelligence. Through the cessation of breathing, sensing, and knowing, living beings decompose and lose their intelligence, but only so there can be a simultaneous re-composition of air-intelligence elsewhere. Diogenes says, “Men and the other living creatures live by means of air, through breathing it. And this is for them both soul [that is, life principle] and intelligence, as will be clearly shown in this work; and if this is removed, then they die and intelligence fails.” (Fr. 7)

Diogenes also says that air is divine. Divinity designated natural power for the Presocratics, who also tended not to anthropomorphize their gods. Instead, a divinity for the first philosophers was more a natural force, usually an elemental power found permeating all of nature and imbuing it with all its creative and destructive power. Along with substance monism, pantheism—the idea that everything is divine, that God is all things—was an idea shared by many of the Presocratics. For Diogenes, his substance monism definitely entailed pantheism. Air-intelligence is divine. Only a god could remain identical to itself while also rationally differentiating itself through an infinity of singular beings. Only a god as well could have the intuitive intelligence to actively and affirmatively know all the self-identical differentiations it expressed of itself. As Diogenes says, it is only nature conceived as an absolutely immanent and divine air-intelligence that could be “both great and strong and eternal and immortal and much-knowing (Fr. 8).” Diogenes summarized all these points wonderfully when he wrote:

And it seems to me that that which has intelligence is what men call air, and that all men are steered by this and that it has power over all things. For this very thing seems to me to be a god and to have reached everywhere and to dispose all things and to be in everything. And there is no single thing that does not have a share of this; but nothing has an equal share of it, one with another, but there are many fashions both of air itself and of intelligence. For it is many-fashioned, being hotter and colder and drier and moister and more stationary and more swiftly mobile, and many other differentiations are in it both of taste and of color unlimited in number. And yet of all living creatures the soul is the same, air that is warmer than the outside, in which we exist, but much cooler than that near the sun. But in none of living creatures is this warmth alike (since it is not even so in individual men); the difference is not great, but as much as still allows them to be similar. Yet it is not possible for anything to become truly alike, one to the other, of the things undergoing differentiation, without becoming the same. Because, then, the differentiation is many-fashioned, living creatures are many fashioned and many in number, resembling each other neither in form nor in way of life nor in intelligence, because of the number of differentiations. Nevertheless, they all live and see and hear by the same thing, and have the rest of their intelligence from the same thing. (Fr. 5)

5. Cosmology and Physiology

Singular beings are not only composed of air, they also live and have intelligence by breathing air. The soul or life principle of all things is an absolute and divine air-intelligence that, in a sense, breathes through itself in all the forms it takes on. Air is both eternal and omnipresent as it takes on an unlimited number of forms. Like many of the Presocratics, Diogenes provides an account of how air modifies itself through a variety of physical compositions ranging from galaxies and solar systems to respiratory, circulatory, and cognitive systems. Diogenes provides us with a cosmogony that explains the creation of the earth and sun on the basis of the condensation and rarefaction of air. In The pseudo-Plutarchean Stromateis, which Eusebius preserved, it is stated that:

Diogenes the Apolloniate premises that air is the element, and that all things are in motion and the worlds innumerable. He gives this account of cosmogony: the whole was in motion, and became rare is some places and dense in others; where the dense ran together centripetally it made the earth, and so the rest by the same method, while the lightest parts took the upper position and produce the sun. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 445)

Diogenes also made some cosmological observations. He gave an interesting account of heavenly bodies that included an attempt to explain meteorites.

Diogenes says that the heavenly bodies are like pumice-stone, and he considers them as the breathing-holes of the world; and they are fiery. With the visible heavenly bodies are carried round invisible stones, which for this reason have no name: they often fall on the earth and are extinguished, like the stone star that made its fiery descent at Aegospotami. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 445)

There are many similarities between Diogenes’ cosmogony and cosmology and that of his fellow Presocratics. First, he posits the existence of innumerable worlds like many other Presocratics. It makes sense that Diogenes asserts an immeasurable plurality of worlds because he places no restrictions to the amount of differentiations and composition air can take. Why wouldn’t there be a plethora of worlds littered throughout the universe insofar as worlds are, by definition, just momentary formations of the universe (air) anyway? Secondly, it is from Anaxagoras that Diogenes likely borrowed the idea of a noetic substance forming a vortex within itself. Thirdly, it was common in the Ionic tradition to describe the origin of the earth as the formation of more concentrated and denser material in the center of such a vortex. Likewise, the rarer material would go to the extremes of the vortex, following the law that differentiation is a symmetrical process whereby like follows like. Lighter air, therefore, tends towards greater heights and extremities while denser air tends to concentrate into relative core positions. With respect to astronomical objects, it seems Diogenes said heavenly bodies were like pumice stone because pumice is both glowing and light, or ‘airy,’ and composed of translucent and very porous bubble walls, which are, once again, qualities that accommodate the substance that Diogenes countenances.

From extrasolar objects and the solar system down to the earth itself, Diogenes continues to explain all physical and psychological phenomena as so many self-modifying processes of one substantial air. Within and through the atmospheric air of our planet, Diogenes addresses the thinking and sensing of particular organisms. The law of like following like is as applicable on earth as it is throughout the cosmos. From Theophrastus’ de sensu, Diogenes is reported as having a detailed theory of sensation and cognition based on the reception and circulation of air within and between singular beings. Each of the five senses are dealt with in terms of how they process air. Degrees of intelligence or cognitive ability are also delineated by the amount and kind of air each being possesses. The differences between beings are defined by how swiftly, and with how much agility, they engender and circulate. Some beings, for example, have more intelligence, or more complex brain activity while others have say, a better sense of smell. All kinds of perception, however, are ways that air processes and modifies itself.

Diogenes attributes thinking and the senses, as also life, to air.  Therefore he would seem to do so by the action of similars (for he says that there would be no action of being acted upon, unless all things were from one). The sense of smell is produced by the air round the brain…Hearing is produced whenever the air within the ears, being moved by the air outside, spreads toward the brain. Vision occurs when things are reflected on the pupil, and it, being mixed with the air within, produces a sensation. A proof of this is that, if there is an inflammation of the veins (that is, those in the eye), there is no mixture with the air within, nor vision, although the reflexion exists exactly as before. Taste occurs to the tongue by what is rare and gentle. About touch he gave no definition, either about its nature or its objects. But after this he attempts to say what is the cause of more accurate sensations, and what sort of objects they have. Smell is keenest for those who have least air in their heads, for it is mixed most quickly; and, in addition, if a man draws it in through a longer and narrower channel; for in this way it is more swiftly assessed. Therefore some living creatures are more perceptive of smell than are men; yet nevertheless, if the smell were symmetrical with the air, with regard to mixture, man would smell perfectly….(Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 448).

It seems that for Diogenes correspondence in perception entails a matching-up of the degrees of air within the brain with air that is being received through the sensitive faculties. Sensation itself is the reception of air by air and so is a mixing of airs through the aerated blood channels that are themselves oxygenated through respiration.  (Diogenes also attempted an anatomy of the veins.) Usually, the reception of air by air takes place in an organism as an agitation or irritation of the sense organs and thus also the brain. An accurate or adequate perception is one in which there is a mutually interpenetrating coalescence of finer air flows within, between, and amongst the parts of organisms and the finer air received through sensations. This entails that a certain kind of affective or sensitive openness, which can be regarded as a susceptibility to finer air, allows for greater perceptual correspondences with the other kinds of air-composites.  Such affective openness implies that one must come to pursue or avoid interaction with other air-composites in accordance with how they increase or decrease one’s respiratory and cognitive abilities. The trick is to have sensitive correspondences serve the rationally differentiated regulatory systems that allow organisms to survive and persevere. Overall, Diogenes was one of the first thinkers to emphasis the relationship between sensation, respiration, and cognition.

Theophrastus continues in his report of Diogenes’ thinking regarding sensation and cognition. Pleasure and pain are also definable by the sensitive reception and circulation of air.

That the air within perceives, being a small portion of the god, is indicated by the fact that often, when we have our mind on other things, we neither see nor hear.  Pleasure and pain come about in this way: whenever air mixes in quantity with blood and lightens it, being in accordance with nature, and penetrates through the whole body, pleasure is produced; but whenever the air is present contrary to nature and does not mix, then the blood coagulates and becomes weaker and thicker, and pain is produced. Similarly, confidence and health and their opposites…Thought, as has been said, is caused by pure and dry air; for a moist emanation inhibits the intelligence; for this reason thought is diminished in sleep, drunkenness, and surfeit. That moisture removes intelligence is indicated by the fact that other living creatures are inferior in intellect, for they breathe the air from the earth and take to themselves moister sustenance. (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield: 1983, 448)

The key to cultivating a stronger intelligence, greater pleasures, and a good sense of taste (for the wise man is the sage, the sapiens, the one who tastes well) is to take in, breathe, and allow to permeate one’s organic structure the finer, lighter, dryer, warmer, and swifter air. To breathe well is to live well. To stand erect, awake, warm-blooded, firm, and at attention is to manifest a stronger and more well-regulated and attuned disposition.  Like Heraclitus, Diogenes advises that one must avoid excessive moistening. To become more god-like, more substantially identical with what one essentially is, one should actively, aggressively, and affirmatively seek out other aerated bodies of similar dispositions and compose well with them. Certain compositions lead to the reproduction of new organic forms. Since air is the vitality of its own natural and substantial existence, it will continuously reproduce itself through the distribution of its own aerated seeds.  Indeed, air, understood as nature’s ubiquitous and eternal living, is constantly conceiving itself, impregnating and giving birth to its own various forms of gradients of denser or finer air.

Diogenes, it is worth mentioning, also had an interest in embryology. The self-conception of air takes place through the intermingling of aerated sperm and eggs. For Diogenes, life grows naturally and intelligently at all levels because of the aerated nature of blood and veins.

And in the continuation he shows that also the sperm of living creatures is aerated and acts of intelligence take place when the air, with the blood, gains possession of the whole body through the veins; in the course of which he gives an accurate anatomy of the veins. Now in this he clearly says that what men call air is the material principle. (Fr. 5)

6. Influence and Historical Role

The Eleatic philosophers were monists, believing that were there two things, we would have to say of one that it is not (the other). They thought, however, that one may not speak of what is not, as one would be speaking of nothing. The fact that there is only one thing in existence was thought to entail that change could not occur, as there would need to be two things for there to be the relata required for a causal relation. Diogenes seems to have agreed with the monistic aspect of the Eleatic philosophy while attempting to accommodate the possibility of change. His move was to claim that one thing might be a causa sui, and that the change we experience is the alteration thereof. The substance best suited as the substrate was thought to be air, and here rings reminiscent the view of Anaximenes. One also finds, arguably, the influence of Anaxagoras, when one considers the claim that this substance is intelligence or nous. Finally, it is worth noting that the idea that the universe is a living being is broached in Plato’s Timaeus. And the idea of substance monism has had other advocates in the history of philosophy, most famous perhaps being Benedict Spinoza

7. References and Further Reading

There are no monographs on Diogenes of Apollonia in English. Unfortunately, Diogenes has been given rather brief attention throughout the secondary literature. Diogenes is usually addressed in chapters in books on the Presocratics.

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul (1 vol. ed.), 1982, 568-592.
  • Burnet, J. Early Greek Philosophy. London: Black (4th ed.), 1930.
  • Diels, H. “Leukippos und Diogenes von Apollonia.” RM 42, 1887, 1-14.
  • Diller, H. “Die philosophiegeschichtliche Stellung des Diogenes von Apollonia.” Hermes 76, 1941, 359-81.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. The Presocratic Tradition from Parmenides to Democritus. Vol. II. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993, 362-381.
  • Huffmeier, F. “Teleologische Weltbetrachtung bei Diogenes von Apollonia.” Philologus 107, 1963, 131-38.
  • Jaeger, Werner. The Theology of the Early Greek Philosophers. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1967, 155-171.
  • Kirk, G.S., J.E. Raven, and M. Schofield. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd edn. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • Laks, Andre. “Soul, Sensation, and Thought.” The Cambridge Companion to Early Greek Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999, 250-270.
  • Laks, Andre. Diogene d’ Apollonie. Paris: Lille, 1983.
  • McKirahan, Richard D. Philosophy Before Socrates. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1994, 344-352.
  • Shaw, J. R. “A Note on the Anatomical and Philosophical Claims of Diogenes of Apollonia.” Aperion 11.1, 1977, 53-7.
  • Warren, James. Presocratics. Berkeley: University of California Press, 2007, 175-181.

Author Information

Jason Dockstader
University College Cork

Plato: Organicism

Organicism is the position that the universe is orderly and alive, much like an organism. According to Plato, the Demiurge creates a living and intelligent universe because life is better than non-life and intelligent life is better than mere life. It is the perfect animal.  In contrast with the Darwinian view that the emergence of life and mind are accidents of evolution, the Timaeus holds that the universe, the world, is necessarily alive and intelligent. And mortal organisms are a microcosm of the great macrocosm.

Although Plato is most famous today for his theory of Forms and for the utopian and elitist political philosophy in his Republic, his later writings Plato promote an organicist cosmology which, prima facie, conflicts with aspects of his theory of Forms and of his signature political philosophy. The organicism is found primarily in the Timaeus, but also in the Philebus, Statesman, and Laws.

Because the Timaeus was the only major dialogue of Plato available in the West during most of the Middle Ages, during much of that period his cosmology was assumed by scholars to represent the mature philosophy of Plato, and when many Medieval philosophers refer to Platonism they mean his organicist cosmology, not his theory of Forms. Despite this, Plato’s organicist cosmology is largely unknown to contemporary philosophers, although many scholars have recently begun to show renewed interest.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Whitehead’s Reading of Plato
    2. Greek Organicism
  2. Plato’s Cosmogony and Cosmology
    1. Creation of the World Animal
    2. The Mortal Organism as Microcosm of the Macrocosm
    3. Creation as Procreation
    4. Emergence of Kosmos from Chaos
  3. Relevance to Plato’s Philosophy
    1. Relevance to Plato’s Aesthetics
    2. Relevance to Plato’s Ethics
    3. Relevance to Plato’s Political Philosophy
    4. Relevance to Plato’s Account of Health and Medicine
    5. Relevance to Plato’s Theory of Forms
  4. Influence of Plato’s Cosmology
    1. Transition to Aristotle’s Organicism
    2. Importance for Contemporary Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

a. Whitehead’s Reading of Plato

In his 1927-28 Gifford Lectures, Whitehead (1978) makes the startling suggestion that Plato’s philosophy is akin to a philosophy of organism. This is surprising to many scholars because Plato’s signature doctrine, the theory of Forms, would seem to be as far removed from a philosophy of organism as possible. On the usual understanding of the theory of Forms, reality is divided into a perfect, eternal, unchanging, world of  Forms or universals, and a separate, finite, imperfect world of perceptible particulars, where the latter is an image of the former and is, in some obscure way, unreal, or less real, than the Forms.  Since living things requires growth and change, and since, according to the theory of Forms, these are mere images of the only genuine realities, the Forms, it would seem there can be no fundamental place for living organisms in Plato’s ontology.

The case for Whitehead’s thesis is based on Plato’s Timaeus, where he  compares the kosmos to a living organism, but also, to a lesser degree, on the Laws, Statesman, Philebus and Critias.   Since the Timaeus is concerned with the temporal world, generally thought to be denigrated by the “other-worldly” Plato, its relevance to Plato’s philosophy has been doubted.   First, the cosmology of the Timaeus is not even presented by Socrates, but by Timaeus, a 5th century Pythagorean.   Second, the Timaeus represents its organicist cosmology as a mere probable story.    Third, although Plato employs myths in most of his dialogues, these are generally combined with discursive argument, but the Timaeus is “myth from beginning to end” (Robin, 1996).   For these reasons, many scholars hold that the Timaeus represents a digression into physical speculations that have more to do with the natural sciences per se than they do with philosophy proper (Taylor, 1928).    Russell (1945) allows that the Timaeus deserves to be studied because it has had such great influence on the history of ideas, but holds that “as philosophy it is unimportant.”  The case is further complicated by the controversy over the longstanding view that the Timaeus is a later period dialogue.  For a discussion of these stylometric and chronological disputes see Kraut (1992), Brandwood (1992), and Meinwald (1992).

It is worth remembering, however, that throughout most of the Middle Ages, the Timaeus was the only Platonic dialogues widely available in the West and most scholars at that time assumed that it represents Plato’s mature views (Knowles, 1989).   Second, the dialogue in the Timaeus appears to take up where that of the Republic leaves off, suggesting that Plato himself saw a continuity between the views in the two works.  It is also worth pointing out that some physicists, such as Heisenberg (1958),  have claimed that the Timaeus provided inspiration for their rejection of the materialism of Democritus in favor of the mathematical forms of Plato and the Pythagoreans (see also Brisson and Meyerstein, 1995).   For these and other reasons, a growing number of scholars have, despite the controversies, begun to return to the Timaeus with renewed philosophical interest (Vlastos, 1975; Ostenfield, 1982; Annas, 1999; Sallis, 1999; Carone, 2000; and so forth.).

b. Greek Organicism

In his introduction to Plato’s works, Cairns (1961)  points out that the Greek view, as far back as we have records, is that the world is orderly and alive.  From this perspective, the failure to appreciate Plato’s organicism is part and parcel of a failure to appreciate Greek organicism more generally. For example, whereas modern scholars view the Milesians as forerunners of modern materialism (Jeans, 1958), the Milesians held that matter is alive (Cornford, 1965; Robin, 1996).  Similarly, Anaximenes did not hold that air is the basis of all things in the same sense, or for the same reasons, that a modern materialist might hold such a view.  He views air as breath and sees air as the basis of all things because he sees the world as a living thing and therefore “wants it to breath” (Robin, 1996; Cornford, 1966). Pythagoras too, who exerted great influence on Plato, saw the world as a living breathing being (Robinson, 1968).    Cornford (1966) notes that Plato’s description in the Timaeus of his world animal as a “well rounded sphere” has been seen by some scholars as the best commentary on Parmenides’ comparison of his One Being to a perfect sphere (raising the possibility of a Parmenidean organicism).    Finally, by stressing that fire is the basis of all things, Heraclitus did not mean that fire is the material out of which all things are made.  His fire is an “ever living” fire (Burnet, 1971).  Similar points could be made about other pre-Socratic philosophers.   The Greek tendency to view the world as a living thing is rooted in the fact that the early Greek notion of nature, physis, was closer in meaning to life than to matter (Cornford, 1965).   This is why, as far back as Hesiod, procreation plays such a prominent role in Greek creation stories, as it does in the Timaeus (Section 2c.).   From this perspective, it is not surprising that Plato develops an organicist cosmology.    It would be surprising if he did not have one.

2. Plato’s Cosmogony and Cosmology

a. Creation of the World Animal

The Timaeus describes the world (kosmos) as a created living being.  The world is created by the “Demiurge  [ho demiourgos]” who follows an “eternal pattern” reminiscent of Plato’s Forms (Carone, 2000).  The materials out of which the kosmos is fashioned are already present.    The eternal patterns or Forms, the Demiurge himself, and the materials, all pre-exist the creation.  Thus, Plato’s Demiurge is not omnipotent, but is more like a craftsman, limited both by the eternal patterns and by the prior matter.  The creative act consists in putting “intelligence in soul and soul in body” in accord with the eternal patterns.  The soul in the Timaeus and Laws is understood as the principle of self-motion.

The pre-existing materials are described as “chaos.”   By “chaos” Plato does not mean the complete absence of order, but a kind of order, perhaps even a mechanical order, opposed to Reason.   This “chaotic” tendency survives the imposition of Form and is always threatening to break out and undermine the rational order of the world.   For this reason Plato’s kosmos exhibits a dynamical quality quite alien to modern thought.

The Demiurge creates a living and intelligent world because life is better than non-life and intelligent life is better than mere life.  It is “the perfect animal.”  In contrast with the Darwinian view that the emergence of life and mind are accidents of evolution, the Timaeus holds that the world is necessarily alive and intelligent.

The Timaeus identifies three different kinds of souls, the rational (eternal) soul, the spirited soul, and the plantlike soul capable of sensation but not of genuine self-motion.   The world-animal possesses the highest and most perfect kind of soul, the rational soul, but it also shares in the two lower types of soul as well.  The world may be the perfect animal, but it is not a perfect being because it possesses the lower types of soul.  The presence of these lower types of soul helps to explain the imperfection in the world.

The Timaeus holds that the world is “solitary.”   The Demiurge only creates one world, not because he is stingy, but because he can only create the best and there can only be one best world.   Since it is solitary, there is nowhere for it to go and nothing for it to perceive.   The perfect-animal has, therefore, no external limbs or sense organs.

The Demiurge gives the world the most suitable shape, that is, it is a sphere with each point on the circumference equidistant from the center.   Since it has no need of sense organs or limbs, it is perfectly smooth.  Although the pre-existing visible body is also a sphere, it turns out that a sphere is also the most suitable choice of shape for the perfect animal (Sect. 4c).  The Demiurge imposes an order on that pre-existing material sphere that makes it suitable for the introduction of a soul.    Thus, Plato does not deny that there are material or mechanical conditions for life and mind.  He only insists that these are subordinated in the world to the more basic rule by reason (McDonough, 1991).

The Demiurge makes the perfect animal in the shape of a sphere since a sphere “is the most like itself of all figures” and that makes for the most beautiful figure.  Unlike the modern view that values are a subjective coloring imposed by the human mind (Putnam, 1990), Plato’s kosmos is intrinsically beautiful and good.   Plato’s science of nature does not seek to strip things of value in order to see them “objectively”, but, rather, to describe the intrinsic values writ large in the perfect visible cosmic organism (Sect. 3a-3c).

The Demiurge puts the soul in the center of the sphere, but it “diffuses” throughout the entire sphere.   The Demiurge synchronizes the two spheres “center to center.”  Thus, Plato distinguishes between the organism’s spiritual center and its bodily center, and holds that these must be made, by the Demiurge, to correspond with each other.  This is an early version of the “correlation thesis” (Putnam, 1981), the view that there must be a correspondence between the mental and material states of the organism.   That which is produced directly by intelligence may only have a teleological explanation, while that caused by matter not controlled by intelligence may have only a physical explanation, but that which is produced by the informing of matter by intelligence admits of both a teleological and a physical explanation.   In that case, the teleological and physical “spheres” must correspond with each other.  The world-animal is One in the sense that it possesses an organic unity by virtue of its central order-imposing soul.

Since the kosmos is a perfect animal,  and since an animal has parts, the world is ”a perfect whole of perfect parts.”   The kosmos is a whole of parts because it “the very image of that whole of which all the animals and their tribes are portions.”  The “whole” of which the kosmos is an image is called “the Form of the Intelligible Animal."

The Form of the Intelligible Animal contains “all intelligible beings, just as this [visible] world contains all other visible creatures.”  The perfect animal must embrace all possible species of “intelligible beings.”   Thus, Plato’s world-animal is actually a whole ecosystem of interrelated animals.    It should not, however, be assumed that the cosmic animal is not also a single organism.   Although the human body is, in one sense, a single organism, it is, in another sense, a whole system of interrelated organisms (the individual cells of the body), which combine to form one more perfect organism.

The view that the Form of the intelligible animal contains all intelligible beings suggests that only animals are intelligible.   Matter as such is not intelligible.  A material thing is only intelligible because it instantiates a Form.  The Timaeus suggests that the total recipe for the instantiation of the Forms is a living organism.  The ideas that only living things are intelligible and that matter per se is unintelligible are foreign to the modern mind.   Nonetheless, Plato sees a close connection between life and intelligibility.

Since there is nothing outside the perfect animal, it exists “in itself.”  Since it exists “in itself,” it is self sufficient in the visible world.  It does depend on the Forms, but it does not depend on anything more basic in the perceptible world.   Since it moves, but is an image of the self-sufficient Forms, it moves in the most self-sufficient way, that is, it is self- moving.   Since there is nothing outside it, it can only move “within its own limits,”  that is, it can only rotate around its own axis.    The circular motion of the perfect animal is the best perceptible image of the perfection and self-sameness of the eternal Forms.

Since the perfect animal is intelligent, it thinks.   Since it is self-moving, it is a self-moving thinker.   Since it is self-sufficient in the visible world, it is, in that realm, absolute spontaneity.   Plato’s characterization of the perfect animal as a “sensible God” expresses the fact that it possesses these divine qualities of self-sufficiency, self movement, and absolute spontaneity deriving from its participation in an eternal pattern.

The Timaeus presents a  complex mathematical account, involving the mixing of various types of being, in various precise proportions, of the creation of the “spherical envelope to the body of the universe,” that is, the heavens.  The more orderly movements of the heavenly bodies are better suited than earthly bodies to represent the eternal patterns, but they are not completely ordered.   In addition to the perfect circular movements of the stars, there is also the less orderly movement of the planets.  Plato distinguishes these as “the same” and “the different.”   Whereas the stars display invariable circular movements, the planets move in diverse manners, a different motion for each of the seven planets.   Thus, the movement of the stars is “undivided,” while that of  the plants is divided into separate diverse motions.   Since the former is superior, the movements of the different are subordinated to those of “the same.”  The entirely regular movement of “the same” is the perfect image of the eternal patterns, while the movement of  “the different” is a manifestation of the imperfect material body of the kosmos.   Nevertheless, since “the different” are in the heavens, they are still much more orderly than the “chaotic” movements of bodies on earth.   Although this account is plainly unbelievable, it sheds light on his concept of an organism and his views about intelligence.

To take one example, Plato invokes the dichotomy of “the same” and “the different” to explain the origins of knowledge and true belief.   Because the soul is composed of both “the same” and “the different,” she is capable of recognizing the sameness or difference in anything that “has being.”  Both knowledge and true opinion achieve truth, for “reason works with equal truth whether she is in the sphere of the diverse or of the same,” but intelligence and knowledge, the work of “the same,” are still superior to true belief, the work of “the different."   Insofar as the heavens display the movements of “the same,” the world animal achieves intelligence and knowledge, but  insofar as “the circle of the diverse” imparts the “intimations of sense” to the soul mere true belief is achieved.    Plato is, in effect, describing a kind of celestial mechanism to explain the origins of the perfect animal’s knowledge on the one hand and true belief on the other.   His view implies that an organism must  be imperfect if it is to have true beliefs about a corporeal world and that these imperfections must be reflected in its “mechanism” of belief.

Because of their perfect circular motions, the heavens are better suited than earthly movements to measure time.    Thus, time is “the moving image of eternity.”  This temporal “image of eternity” is eternal and “moves in accord with number” while eternity itself “rests in unity."  But time is not a representation of just any Form.  It is an image of the Form of the Intelligible Animal.   Since time is measured by the movement of the perfect bodies in the heavens, and since that movement constitutes the life of the perfect animal, time is measured by the movement of the perfect life on display in the heavens, establishing a connection between time and life carried down to Bergson (1983).

b. The Mortal Organism as Microcosm of the Macrocosm

The Demiurge creates the world-animal, but leaves the creation of mortal animals to the "created gods,” by which Plato may mean the earth (female) and the sun (male).  Since the created gods imitate the creator, mortal animals are also copies of the world-animal.   Thus, man is a microcosm of the macrocosm, a view that extends from the pre-Socratics (Robinson, 1968), through Scholastic philosophy (Wulf, 1956) and the Renaissance (Cassirer, 1979), to Leibniz (1968), Wittgenstein (1966), Whitehead (1978), and others.

Although plants and the lesser animals are briefly discussed in the Timaeus, the only mortal organism described in detail is man.  Since imperfections are introduced at each stage of copying, man is less perfect than the cosmic-animal, the lesser animals are less perfect than man, and plants are less perfect than the lesser animals.  This yields a hierarchy of organisms, a “great chain of being,” arranged from the most perfect world-animal at the top to the least perfect organisms at the bottom (Lovejoy, 1964).

Since an ordinary organism is a microcosm of the macrocosm, the structure of a mortal organism parallels that of the macrocosm.  Since the structure of the macrocosm is the structure of the heavens (broadly construed to include the earth at the center of the heavenly spheres), one need not rely on empirical studies of ordinary biological organisms.  Since the Timaeus holds that the archetype of an organism is “writ large” in the heavens, the science of astronomy is the primary guide to the understanding of living things. In this respect, our modern view owes more to Aristotle, who accorded greater dignity to the empirical study of ordinary living things (Hamilton, 1964, p. 32).

Since the macrocosm is a sphere with the airy parts at the periphery and the earth at the center, ordinary organisms also have a spherical structure with the airy parts at the periphery and the heavier elements at the center.   Since an ordinary organism is less perfect than the world animal, its spherical shape is distorted.   Although there are three kinds of souls, these are housed in separate bodily spheres.   The rational, or immortal, soul is located in the sphere of the head.  The two mortal souls are encased in the sphere of the thorax and the sphere of the abdomen.   The division of the mortal soul into two parts is compared with the division of a household into the male and female “quarters.”

The head contains the first principle of life.  The soul is united with the body at its center.  Since Plato uses “marrow” as a general term for the material at the center of a seed, the head contains the brain “marrow” suited to house the most divine soul.  There are other kinds of “marrows” at the centers of the chest and abdomen.    The sphere is the natural shape for an animal because the principle of generation takes the same form as a seed, and most seeds are spherical.  The head is a “seed” that gives birth to immortal thoughts.  The thorax and abdomen are “seeds” that give birth to their own appropriate motions.

The motions in the various organic systems imitate the circular motions of the heavens.   Respiration is compared to “the rotation of a wheel."    Since there can be no vacuum, air taken in at one part forces the air already there to move out of its place, which forces the air further down to move, and so on.  Plato gives a similar account of the circulatory system.  The blood is compelled to move by the action of the heart in the center of the chest.  “[T]he particles of the blood … which are contained within the frame of the animal as in a sort of heaven, are compelled to imitate the motion of the universe.”    The blood circulates around the central heart just as the stars circulate around the central earth.   Similar accounts are given of ingestion and evacuation.   The action of the lungs, heart, and so forth, constitutes the bodily mechanism that implements the organic telos.    In the Phaedo and Laws, Plato compares the Earth, the “true mother of us all,” to an organism with its own circulatory systems of subterranean rivers of water and lava.  The organic model of the heavens is the template for an organic model of the geological structure of the earth.

Since the perfect animal has no limbs or sense organs, “the other six [the non-circular] motions were taken away from him.”  Since there is no eternal pattern for these chaotic motions associated with animal life, they are treated as unintelligible.  There is, for Plato, no science of chaos.  His remarks are consistent with the view that there can be a mechanics of the non-circular bodily motions, but since such a mechanics cannot give the all- important reason for the motion it so does not qualify as a science in Plato’s sense.

Since the rise of the mechanistic world view in the 18th century, it has been impossible for modern thinkers to take Plato’s cosmology seriously.  It cannot, however, be denied that it is a breathtaking vision.   If nothing else, it is a startling reminder how differently ancient thinkers viewed the universe.   According to the Timaeus, we on earth live at the center of one unique perfect cosmic organism, in whose image we have been created, and whose nature and destiny has been ordained by imperceptible transcendent forces from eternity.  When we look up at the night sky, we are not seeing mere physical bodies moving in accord with blind mechanical laws, but, rather, are, quite literally, seeing the radiant airy periphery of that single perfect cosmic life, the image of our own (better) selves, from which we draw our being, our guidance, and our destiny.

Finally, Plato is, in the Timaeus, fashioning important components of our concept of an organism, a concept which survives even when his specific quaint theories, do not.  For example, biologists have noted that animals, especially those, like Plato’s perfect animal, that have no need of external sense organs or limbs, tend towards a spherical shape organized around a center (Buchsbaum, 1957).  Indeed, central state materialism, the modern view that the intelligence is causally traceable to the neural center, is, arguably, a conceptual descendent of Plato’s notion of an organism organized around a center.

c. Creation as Procreation


Whereas in his earlier dialogues Plato had distinguished Forms and perceptible objects, the latter copies of the former,  the Timaeus announces the need to posit yet another kind of being, “the Receptacle,” or “nurse of all generation.”  The Receptacle is like the Forms insofar as it is a “universal nature” and is always “the same,” but it must be “formless” so that it can “take every variety of form.”   The Receptacle is likened to “the mother” of all generation, while “the source or spring” of generation, the Demiurge, is likened to the father.   In the Timaeus, the creation of the world is not a purely intellectual act, but, following the sexual motif in pre-Socratic cosmogony, it is modeled on sexual generation.

Plato’s argument for positing the Receptacle is that since visible objects do not exist in themselves, and since they do not exist in the Forms, they must exist “in another,” and the Receptacle is this “other” in which visible objects exist, that is, the argument for positing the Receptacle is premised on the ontologically  dependent status of visible objects.

Since the perfect motion is circular, generation too moves in a circle.  This is true of the generation of the basic elements, earth, air, fire, and water, out of each other, but it is also true of animal generation.  Since the parents of a certain type only generate offspring of the same type, the cycle of procreation always returns, in a circular movement, to the same point from which it started    It is only in creating a copy of themselves, which then go on to do that same, that mortal creatures partake of the eternal (Essentially the same picture is found in Plato’s Symposium and in Aristotle’s Generation of Animals).  Since the sexual act presupposes the prior existence of the male and female principles, the procreation model also explains why Plato’s Demiurge does not create from nothing.

Plato identifies the Receptacle with space, but also suggests that the basic matters, such as fire, are part of its nature, so it cannot be mere space.   Although Plato admits that it somehow “partakes of the intelligible,” he also states that it “is hardly real” and that we only behold it “as in a dream.”   Despite the importance of this view in the Timaeus, Plato is clearly puzzled, and concludes that the Receptacle is only apprehended by a kind of “spurious reason.”   Given his comparison of the receptacle to the female principle, he may think that visible objects are dependent on “another” in something like the sense in which a foetus is dependent on the mother’s womb.  On the other hand, Plato admits that these are murky waters and it is doubtful that the sexual imagery can be taken literally.

d. Emergence of Kosmos from Chaos

The Western intellectual tradition begins, arguably, with the cosmogony in Hesiod’s Theogony, according to which the world emerges from chaos.  A similar story is found in Plato’s creation story in the Timaeus, where, in the beginning, everything is in “disorder” and any “proportion” between things is accidental.   None of the kinds, such as fire, water, and so forth, exist.  These had to be “first set in order” by God, who then, out of them, creates the cosmic animal.   Since the root meaning of the Greek “kosmos” is orderly arrangement, the Timaeus presents a classic picture of the emergence of order out of chaos.

The doctrine of emergent evolution, associated with Bergson (1983), Alexander (1920), and Morgan (1923), is the view that the laws of nature evolve over time (Nagel, 1979).   Since, in the Timaeus, the laws of nature are not fixed by the conditions in the primordial “chaos,” but only arise, under the supervision of the Demiurge, in a temporal process, Plato’s cosmology appears to anticipate these later views.  Mourelatos (1986) argues that emergentism is present in the later pre-Socratic philosophers.  Although emergentism has been out of fashion for some time, it has recently been enjoying a revival (See Kim, Beckermann, and Flores, 1992; McDonough, 2002; Clayton and Davies, 2006, and so forth).

3. Relevance to Plato’s Philosophy

a. Relevance to Plato’s Aesthetics

Since reason dictates that the best creation is the perfect animal, the living kosmos is the most beautiful created thing.   Since the perfect animal is a combination of soul and body, these must be combined in the right proportion.   The correct proportion of these constitutes the organic unity of the organism.   Thus, the beauty of an organism consists in its organic unity.   Since other mortal organisms are microcosms of the macrocosm, the standard of beauty for a mortal organism is set by the beauty of the kosmos.   The beauty of a human being is, in effect, modeled on the beauty of a world.

There is a link between beauty and pleasure, but pleasure is derivative.  Since beauty is a matter of  rational proportion, a rational person naturally finds the sight of beauty pleasurable.   Thus, a rational person finds a well proportioned organism beautiful, where the relevant proportions include not merely physical proportions but the most basic proportion between body and soul.   Finally, since an organism has an organic unity, rationality, beauty, health and virtue can only occur together.    Thus, Plato’s aesthetics shades into his ethics, his view of medicine, and his conception of philosophy itself.

b. Relevance to Plato’s Ethics

Perhaps the most basic objection to Plato’s ethics is the charge that his view that the Forms are patterns for conduct is empty of content.   What can it mean for a changeable, corporeal, mortal, living creature to imitate a non-living immaterial, eternal, unchanging, abstract object?   Plato’s organicist cosmology addresses this gap in his ethical theory.

Since the kosmos is copied from the Form of the Intelligible Animal, and since man is a microcosm of the macrocosm, there is a kinship between the rational part of man and the cosmic life on display in the heavens.   There is a close link, foreign to the modern mind, between ethics and astronomy (Carone, 2000).  This explains why, in the Theaetetus, Socrates states that the philosopher spends their time “searching the heavens.”

Specifically, the ethical individual must strive to imitate the self-sufficiency of the kosmos.  Since the most fundamental dimension of self-sufficiency is self-movement, the ethical individual must strive to be self-moving (like the heavenly bodies).  Since the eternal soul is the rational soul, not the animal or vegetable soul, the ethical individual aims at the life of self-moving rational contemplation.  Since the highest form of the rational life is the life of philosophy, the ethical life coincides with the life of philosophy.

As self-moving, the ethical individual is not moved by external forces, but by the “laws of destiny.”  One must not interpret this in a modern sense.  Plato’s ethical individual is not a cosmic rebel.   The ethical individual does not have their own individualistic destiny.  Since a mortal living being is a microcosm of the macrocosm, it shares in the single law of destiny of the kosmos.  Socrates had earlier stated the analogous view in the Meno that “all nature is akin.”  There is a harmony between man’s law of destiny and that of the kosmos.   Because of their corrupt bodily nature, human beings have fallen away from their cosmic destiny.   Thus, the fundamental ethical imperative is that human beings must strive to reunite with the universal cosmic life from which they have fallen away, the archetype of which is displayed in the heavens.   The ethical law for man is but a special case of the universal law of destiny that applies to all life in the universe.

The bad life is the unbalanced life.   A life is unbalanced when it falls short of the ideal organic unity.   Thus, evil is a kind of disease of the soul.   Since the body is the inferior partner in the union of soul and body, evil results from the undue influence of the body on the soul  Since body and soul are part of an organic unity, and since the soul does not move without the body and vice versa, the diseases of the soul are diseases of the body and vice versa.  Due regard must be given to the bodily needs, but since the soul is the superior partner in that union, the proper proportion is achieved when the rational soul rules the body.   The recipe for a good life is the same as the recipe for a healthy organism.   Thus, the ethics of the Timaeus shades into an account of health and medicine (Sect. 3c).   Since the ethical individual is the philosopher, the account of all of these shades in to account of the philosopher as well.   The ethical individual, the healthy individual, the beautiful individual, and the philosopher are one and the same.

The cosmology of the Timaeus may also serve to counterbalance the elitism in Plato’s earlier ethical views.  Whereas, in Plato’s middle period dialogues, it is implied that goodness and wisdom are only possible for the best human beings (philosophers), the Timaeus suggests the more egalitarian view that since human life is a microcosm of the macrocosm, ethical salvation is possible for all human beings (Carone, 2000).

Plato’s organicism also suggests a more optimistic view of ethical life than is associated with orthodox Platonism.  Whereas, in Plato’s middle period dialogues, the ethical person is represented to be at the mercy of an evil world, and unlikely to be rewarded for their good efforts, the Timaeus posits a “cosmic mechanism” in which virtue is its own reward (Carone, 2000).   Although Socrates may be victimized by unjust men, the ultimate justice is meted out, not in the human law courts, but in the single universal cosmic life.

On the more negative side, Plato’s celestial organicism does commit him to a kind of astrology:  The Demiurge “assigned to each soul a star, and having there placed them as in a chariot, he … declared to them the laws of destiny.”  Taken literally, this opens Plato to easy caricature, but taken symbolically, as it may well be intended, it is a return to the Pythagorean idea that ethical salvation is achieved, not by setting oneself up in individual opposition to the world, but by reuniting with the cosmic rhythm from which one has fallen away (Allen, 1966).   Although this may look more like a cult or religion to modern thinkers, it is worth noting that it does anticipate the criticism of  the human-centered vision of ethics by the modern “deep ecology” movement (Naess, 1990).

c. Relevance to Plato’s Political Philosophy

Since Plato sees an analogy between the polis and the kosmos (Carone, 2000), and since the kosmos is a living organism, Plato’s concept of organism illuminates his account of the polis.   Just as the kosmos is a combination of Reason (Nous) and Necessity (chaos), so too is the polis.   Just as Demiurge brings the kosmos into being by making the primordial chaos submit to Reason, so too, the Statesman brings the polis into being by making the chaos of human life submit to reason.  Carone (2000) suggests that politics, for Plato, is itself is a synthesis of Reason and Necessity.   It is, in this connection, significant, that in Greek, the word “Demiurge” can mean magistrate (Carone, 2000). See Plato's Political Philosophy.

d. Relevance to Plato’s Account of Health and Medicine

Since an organism is an organic whole, beauty, virtue, wisdom, and health must occur together.   Just as Plato’s organicism issues in an aesthetics and an ethics, it also issues in an account of medicine.   Health is a state of orderly bodily motions induced by the soul, while disease is a state of disorder induced by the chaos of the body.   The diseases of the soul, such as sexual intemperance, are caused by the undue influence of the body on the soul, with the consequence that a person who is foolish is not so voluntarily.

Since an organism is an organic whole, one does not treat the heart in order to cure the person.  One treats the whole person in order to cure the heart.   Since the union of body and soul is fundamental, health requires the correct proportion between them.  Since the enemy of health is the chaos of the body, health is achieved by imitating the rational pattern of the heavens.   Since the heavens are self-moving, that motion is the best which is self-produced.   Thus, a self-imposed “regimen” of rational discipline and gymnastic, including the arts and all philosophy, is the optimal way to manage disease.

Unfortunately, most professors of medicine fail to see that disease is a natural part of life.  Although mortal organisms live within limits, professors of medicine are committed to the impossible task of contravening these limits by external force, medications, surgery, and so forth.  By ignoring an organism’s inherent limits, they fail to respect the inner laws of harmony and proportion in nature.   Just as self-movement is, in general, good, movement caused by some external agency is, in general, bad.   Since an organism is a self-moving rational ordering with its own inherent limits, the best course is to identify the unhealthy habits that have led to the malady and institute a “regimen” to restore the organism to its natural cycles.   In a concession to common sense, however, Plato does allow that intervention by external force may be permissible when the disease is “very dangerous.”

Plato’s view of medicine may seem quaint, but since, on his view, beauty, health, virtue, and wisdom are aspects of (or, perhaps, flow from) a fundamental condition of organic unity, his views on medicine shed light on his aesthetics, ethics, and his conception of philosophy.   Health is, in various Platonic dialogues (Republic 444c-d, Laws, 733e, and so forth.), associated with the philosophical and virtuous life.  The fact that the Timaeus’ recipe for health includes a strong dose of “all philosophy” betokens Plato’s view that health, like wisdom and virtue, are specific states of an organism that derive, and can only derive, from a certain central unifying power of the philosophic soul.

e. Relevance to Plato’s Theory of Forms

Although it may seem that Plato’s organicism is irrelevant to his theory of Forms, or even that it is incompatible with it, it is arguable that it supplements and strengthens the theory of Forms.  The three main tenets of the theory of Forms are that (1) the world of Forms is separate from the world of perceptible objects (the two-world view), (2)  perceptible objects are images or copies of the Forms, and (3)  perceptible objects are unreal or “less real” than the Forms.

With regard to the first thesis, there appears to be a tension between Plato’s organicism and the two-world view.  f the kosmos is perfect and beautiful, not infer that the Forms are not separate from the kosmos but are present in it?   On the other hand, since Aristotle says in the Metaphysics that Plato never abandoned the two-world theory, it is prudent to leave the first thesis unchanged.  Even if Plato’s organicism undercuts some of the original motivations for the two-world view, it does not require its rejection (Sect. 4b).

Although Plato’s organicism does not require a rejection of the second thesis, the view that perceptible objects are images of the Forms, it puts it in a different light. Rather, it suggests that perceptible objects are not images of Forms in the sense in which a photograph is an image of a man, but in something like the sense in which a child is an image of its parents (Sect. 2c).   From this perspective, the orthodox reading of Plato relies on a one-sided view of the image-model and thereby makes Plato’s theory of Forms appear to denigrate the perceptible world more than it really must do (Patterson, 1985).

Plato’s organicism also puts the third thesis, the view that perceptible objects are less real than the Forms, in a new light.   Since most philosophers see the picture of degrees of reality as absurd, Plato’s views are open to easy ridicule.   However, Plato’s organicism suggests that this objection is based on a confusion.     On this view, when Plato states or implies that some items are less real than others, he is arranging them in a hierarchy based on to the degree in which they measure up to a certain ideal of organic unity.  On this scale, a man has more “being” than a tomato because a man has a higher degree of organic unity than a tomato.    That has nothing to do with the absurd view that tomatoes do not exist or that they only exist to a lesser degree.   The view that Plato is committed to these absurd ideas derives from an equivocation of Plato’s notion of “being” (roughly organic unity) with the notion of existence denoted by the existential quantifier.

Rather than being either irrelevant to Plato’s philosophy or incompatible with it, Plato’s organicism provides new interpretations of certain concepts in those theories.   Indeed, it suggests that some of the standard criticisms of Plato’s views are based on equivocations.

4. Influence of Plato’s Cosmology

a. Transition to Aristotle’s Organicism

Although Plato’s organicism does seem to be consistent with a theory of Forms, it does not come without a price for that theory.  The theory of Forms had been posited to act as causes, as standards, and as objects of knowledge (Prior, 1985), and Plato’s organicism does undermine some of the original motivations for the theory of Forms.  For example, Plato’s argument that the Forms are needed as standards requires a depreciation of the perceptible world. If living organisms are not merely an image of perfection and beauty, but are themselves perfect and beautiful, then these can act as intelligible standards and there is no special need to posit another separate world of superior intelligible existence. Similar arguments can be extended to the view that Forms are needed as causes and as objects of knowledge.  If one enriches the perceptible world by populating it with intelligible entities, that is, living organisms possessed of their own internal idea, there is no need to look for intelligible standards, causes, or objects of knowledge, in a separate Platonic realm.  In that case, positing a world of separate Forms is an unnecessary metaphysical hypothesis.  This is precisely the direction taken by Aristotle.

Aristotle follows Plato in speaking of form and matter, but, unlike Plato, he does not separate the form from the perceptible objects. Aristotle holds that what is real are substances, roughly, individual packages of formed matter. However, not just any perceptible entity is a substance.  In the Metaphysics (1032a15-20), Aristotle states that “animals and plants and things of that kind” are substances “if anything is.”   On this view, part of the importance of the Timaeus is that it is intermediary between Plato’s orthodox theory of Forms and Aristotle’s theory substance (Johansen, 2004), a point which is lost if the Timaeus is dismissed as a mere literary work with no philosophical significance.  See Sellars (1967), Furth (1987), and McDonough (2000) for further discussions of Aristotle’s organicism.

b. Importance for Contemporary Philosophy


Since Plato’s organicist cosmology includes many plainly unbelievable views (Russell, 1945), the question arises why modern philosophers should take it seriously. Several important points of importance for contemporary philosophy have emerged.  First, Plato’s organicist cosmology is relevant to the interpretation of his theory of Forms by providing new interpretations of key terms in that pivotal theory, and it may even provide an escape from some of the standard objections of that theory (Sect. 4b). Second, Plato’s organicism is intimately linked to his notion of man as the microcosm, a view which appears again in Whitehead’s process philosophy, Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, and others. Third, Plato’s organicism illuminates his ethical views (Sect. 3.2). Fourth, since Plato conceives of the polis on analogy with an organism, it sheds light on his political philosophy (Sect. 3d). Fifth, Plato’s organicism illuminates his account of health and medicine (Sect. 3d), which, in turn, is the classical inspiration for modern holistic views of health and medicine. Sixth, the concept of an organism as, roughly, a sphere organized around a causal center, of which modern “central state materialism is a conceptual descendent,  traces, arguably, to Plato’s Timaeus (Sect. 2b).  Seventh, the Timaeus deserves to be recognized for its contribution to the history of emergentism, which has again become topical in the philosophy of mind (Sect. 2d). Eighth, Aristotle’s theory of substance bears certain conceptual and historical connections to Plato’s organicism (Sect. 4b).  To the degree that these views are important to contemporary philosophy, and history of philosophy, Plato’s organicism is important as well.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristotle. 1951.  Metaphysics. Trans. W.D. Ross. The Basic Works of Aristotle. Ed.Richard McKeon.  Pp. 689-933.
  • Aristotle.  1953. Generation of Animals. A.L. Peck, Trans. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press & London, England: William Heinemann, Ltd.
  • Plato. 1968. Republic. Trans.,  Alan Bloom. New York and London: Basic Books.
  • Plato. 1969. Apology. Hugh Tredennick, Trans. Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp.3-26.
  • Plato.  1969.  Phaedo. Hugh Tredennick, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 40-98.
  • Plato.  1969.  Gorgias.  W.D. Woodhead, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 229-307.
  • Plato. 1969.   Protagoras.   W.K.C. Guthrie, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 308-352.
  • Plato.  1969.  Theaetetus.  F.M. Cornford, Trans. Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 957-1017.
  • Plato.  1969.  Sophist.  F.M. Cornford, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 845-919.
  • Plato.  1969.  Philebus.   R. Hackforth, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1086-1150.
  • Plato.   1969.   Timaeus.   Benjamin Jowett, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1151-1211.
  • Plato.  1969.  Laws.  A.E. Taylor, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1225-1516.
  • Plato.  1997.  Symposium.  Alexander Nehamas and Paul Woodruff, Trans.  Plato: Complete Works.  John Cooper, Ed.  Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett. Pp. 457-505.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Allen, Reginald E.  1966.  Introduction to Greek Philosophy: Thales to Aristotle.  Ed. Reginald E. Allen.  New York: The Free Press.  Pp. 1-23.
  • Alexander, S. I.  1920.  Space, Time, and Deity, 2 vols. London: Macmillan.
  • Bergson, Henri.  1983.  Creative Evolution.  A. Mitchell, Trans.  Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Brandwood, Leonard.  1992.  “Stylometry and Chronology.”  The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 90-120.
  • Brisson,  Luc, and Meyerstein, F. Walter.    1995.  Inventing the Universe: Plato's Timaeus, the Big Bang, and the Problem of Scientific Knowledge. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Buchsbaum, Ralph.  1957.  Animals Without Backbones. Vol. I.  Middlesex, England: Penguin Books.
  • Burnet, John.  1971.  Early Greek Philosophy.   London: Adam and Charles Black.
  • Cairns, Huntington.  1961.  Introduction to The Collected Dialogues of Plato.  Princeton: Princeton University Press. Pp. xiii-xxv.
  • Cassirer, Ernst.  1979.  The Individual and the Cosmos in Renaissance Philosophy.  Trans. Mario Domandi.  Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1965.   From Religion to Philosophy:  A Study in the Origins of Western Speculation.  New York: Harper and Row.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1966.  Plato’s Cosmology:  The Timaeus of Plato.  The Liberal Arts Press.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1997.  Introduction to Plato:  Timaeus.  Indianapolis: Hackett.  Pp. ix-xv.
  • Carone, Gabriela Roxana.  2005.  Plato’s Cosmology and its Ethical Dimensions.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Clayton, Philip, and Davies, Paul., Ed’s.  2006.   The Re-Emergence of Emergence: The Emergentist Hypothesis from Science to Religion.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Furth, Montgomery.  1988.  Substance, Form, and Psyche: An Aristotelian Metaphysics.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hamilton, Edith.  1964.  The Greek Way.  New York: The W.W. Norton Co.
  • Heisenberg, Werner.  1958.  Physics and Philosophy.   London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Johansen, Thomas Kjeller.  2004.  Plato’s Natural Philosophy: A Study of the Timaeus-Critias.   Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kim,  Jaegwon, Beckermann, Angsar, and Flores, Hans, Ed’s.  1992.  Emergence or Reduction? Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Knowles, David.  1989.  Evolution of Medieval Thought.  United Kingdom: Longman.
  • Kraut, Richard.  1992.  “Introduction to the Study of Plato.”   The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 1-50.
  • Leibniz, G.W.  1968.  “Principles of Nature and Grace."  Leibniz: Philosophical Writings.  Trans, Mary Morris.  New York: Dutton & London: Dent.  Pp. 21-31.
  • Lovejoy, A.O.  1964.  The Great Chain of Being.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • McDonough, Richard.  1991. “Plato’s not to Blame for Cognitive Science.”  Ancient Philosophy. Vol. 11.  1991.  Pp. 301-314.
  • McDonough, Richard.  2000.  "Aristotle's Critique of Functionalist Theories of  Mind."  Idealistic Studies.  Vol. 30.  No. 3.  pp. 209-232.
  • McDonough, Richard.  2002.  “Emergence and Creativity: Five Degrees of Freedom” (including a discussion with the editor).  In Creativity, Cognition and Knowledge.  Terry Dartnall, Ed.  London:  Praeger.  Pp. 283-320.
  • Meinwald, Constance C.  1992.  “Goodbye to the Third Man.”  The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 365-396.
  • Morgan, Lloyd.  1923.  Emergent Evolution. London: Williams and Norgate, 1923.
  • Mourelatos,  A.  1986.  “Quality, Structure, and Emergence in Later Pre-Socratic Philosophy.”  Proceedings of the Boston Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy.  2,  Pp. 127-194.
  • Muirhead, John H.  1931.  The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy.  New York: The Macmillan Company & London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Naess, Arne.  1990.  Ecology, Community, Lifestyle: Outelines of an Ecosophy.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nagel, Ernst.  1979.  The Structure of Science.  Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Patterson, Richard.  1985.  Image and Reality in Plato’s Metaphysics.  Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Prior, William J.  1985.  The Unity and Development of Plato’s Metaphysics.  LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1981.  Reason, Truth, and History.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary.  1990.  Realism with a Human Face.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Robin, Leon.  1996.  Greek Thought and the Origins of the Scientific Spirit.  London and New York: Routledge.
  • Robinson, John Mansley.  1968.  An Introduction to Early Greek Philosophy.  Houghton Mifflin College Division.
  • Russell, Bertrand.  1945.  A History of Western Philosophy.  New York: Simon & Schuster.
  • Sallis, John.   1999.  Chorology:  On Beginning in Plato’s Timaeus.  Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid.  1967.  “Raw Materials, Subjects, and Substrata.”   Philosophical Perspectives.   Springfield, Illinois:  Charles C. Thomas, Publisher.  Pp. 137-152.
  • Taylor, A.E.  1928.  A Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. 1975.  Plato’s Universe.  Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • Whitehead, A. N.  1978.  Process and Reality (Corrected Edition).   New York: Macmillan and London: Collier Macmillan.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig.  1966.  Tractatus-logico-philosophicus.  Trans, D F. Pears and B. F. McGuiness.  New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul Ltd.
  • Wulf, Maurice De.  1956.  Scholastic Philosophy.   New York: Dover Publications.

Author Information

Richard McDonough
Arium Academy and James Cook University

Ancient Greek Philosophy

greek_vaseThe Ancient Greek philosophers have played a pivotal role in the shaping of the western philosophical tradition. This article surveys the seminal works and ideas of key figures in the Ancient Greek philosophical tradition from the Presocratics to the Neoplatonists. It highlights their main philosophical concerns and the evolution in their thought from the sixth century BCE to the sixth century CE.

The Ancient Greek philosophical tradition broke away from a mythological approach to explaining the world, and it initiated an approach based on reason and evidence. Initially concerned with explaining the entire cosmos, the Presocratic philosophers strived to identify its single underlying principle. Their theories were diverse and none achieved a consensus, yet their legacy was the initiation of the quest to identify underlying principles.

This sparked a series of investigations into the limit and role of reason and of our sensory faculties, how knowledge is acquired and what knowledge consists of. Here we find the Greek creation of philosophy as “the love of wisdom,” and the birth of metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics. Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle were the most influential of the ancient Greek philosophers, and they focused their attention more on the role of the human being than on the explanation of the material world. The work of these key philosophers was succeeded by the Stoics and Epicureans who were also concerned with practical aspects of philosophy and the attainment of happiness. Other notable successors are Pyrrho's school of skepticism and the Neoplatonists such as Plotinus who tried to unify Plato's thought with theology.

Table of Contents

  1. Presocratics
  2. Socrates and his Followers
  3. Plato
  4. Aristotle
  5. Stoicism
  6. Epicureanism
  7. Skepticism
  8. Neoplatonism

1. Presocratics

The Western philosophical tradition began in ancient Greece in the 6th century BCE. The first philosophers are called "Presocratics" which designates that they came before Socrates. The Presocratics were from either the eastern or western regions of the Greek world. Athens -- home of Socrates, Plato and Aristotle -- is in the central Greek region and was late in joining the philosophical game. The Presocratic's most distinguishing feature is emphasis on questions of physics; indeed, Aristotle refers to them as "Investigators of Nature". Their scientific interests included mathematics, astronomy, and biology. As the first philosophers, though, they emphasized the rational unity of things, and rejected mythological explanations of the world. Only fragments of the original writings of the Presocratics survive, in some cases merely a single sentence. The knowledge we have of them derives from accounts of early philosophers, such as Aristotle's Physicsand Metaphysics, The Opinions of the Physicists by Aristotle's pupil Theophratus, and Simplicius, a Neoplatonist who compiled existing quotes.

The first group of Presocratic philosophers were from Ionia. The Ionian philosophers sought the material principle (archê) of things, and the mode of their origin and disappearance. Thales of Miletus (about 640 BCE) is reputed the father of Greek philosophy. He declared water to be the basis of all things. Next came Anaximander of Miletus (about 611-547 BCE), the first writer on philosophy. He assumed as the first principle an undefined, unlimited substance (to apeiron)itself without qualities, out of which the primary opposites, hot and cold, moist and dry, became differentiated. His countryman and younger contemporary, Anaximenes, took for his principle air, conceiving it as modified, by thickening and thinning, into fire, wind, clouds, water, and earth. Heraclitus of Ephesus (about 535-475 BCE) assumed as the principle of substance aetherial fire. From fire all things originate, and return to it again by a never-resting process of development. All things, therefore, are in a perpetual flux. However, this perpetual flux is structured by logos-- which most basically means 'word,' but can also designate 'argument,' 'logic,' or 'reason' more generally. The logos which structures the human soul mirrors the logos which structures the ever-changing processes of the universe.

Philosophy was first brought into connection with practical life by Pythagoras of Samos (about 582-504 BCE), from whom it received its name: "the love of wisdom". Regarding the world as perfect harmony, dependent on number, he aimed at inducing humankind likewise to lead a harmonious life. His doctrine was adopted and extended by a large following of Pythagoreans, including Damon, especially in Lower Italy.

That country was also the home of the Eleatic doctrine of the One, called after the town of Elea, the headquarters of the school. It was founded by Xenophanes of Colophon (born about 570 BCE), the father of pantheism, who declared God to be the eternal unity, permeating the universe, and governing it by his thought. His great disciple, Parmenides of Elea (born about 511), affirmed the one unchanging existence to be alone true and capable of being conceived, and multitude and change to be an appearance without reality. This doctrine was defended by his younger countryman Zeno in a polemic against the common opinion, which sees in things multitude, becoming, and change. Zeno propounded a number of celebrated paradoxes, much debated by later philosophers, which try to show that supposing that there is any change or multiplicity leads to contradictions. The primary legacy of Zeno is that subsequent scholars became very aware of the difficulty of properly handling the concept of infinity.

Empedocles of Agrigentum (born 492 BCE) appears to have been partly in agreement with the Eleatic School, partly in opposition to it. On the one hand, he maintained the unchangeable nature of substance; on the other, he supposes a plurality of such substances -- i. e. the four elements, earth, water, air, and fire. Of these the world is built up, by the agency of two ideal principles as motive forces -- namely, love as the cause of union, strife as the cause of separation. Empedocles was also the first person to propound an evolutionary account of the development of species.

Anaxagoras of Clazomenae (born about 500 BCE) also maintained the existence of an ordering principle as well as a material substance, and while regarding the latter as an infinite multitude of imperishable primary elements, qualitatively distinguished, he conceived divine reason or Mind (nous) as ordering them. He referred all generation and disappearance to mixture and resolution respectively. To him belongs the credit of first establishing philosophy at Athens, in which city it reached its highest development, and continued to have its home for one thousand years without intermission.

The first explicitly materialistic system was formed by Leucippus (fifth century BCE) and his pupil Democritus of Abdera (born about 460 BCE). This was the doctrine of atoms -- literally 'uncuttables' -- small primary bodies infinite in number, indivisible and imperishable, qualitatively similar, but distinguished by their shapes. Moving eternally through the infinite void, they collide and unite, thus generating objects which differ in accordance with the varieties, in number, size, shape, and arrangement, of the atoms which compose them.

The efforts of all these earlier philosophers had been directed somewhat exclusively to the investigation of the ultimate basis and essential nature of the external world. Hence their conceptions of human knowledge, arising out of their theories as to the constitution of things, had been no less various. The Eleatics, for example, had been compelled to deny that senses give one any access to the truth, since to the world of sense, with its multitude and change, they allowed only a phenomenal existence. However, reason can give one knowledge of what the One is like--or, more accurately, what it is not like.

Retaining the skepticism of the Eleatics about the senses, while rejecting their doctrines about the ability of reason to reach truth apart from the senses, the Sophists held that all thought rests solely on the apprehensions of these senses and on subjective impression, and that therefore we have no other standards of action than convention for the individual. Specializing in rhetoric, the Sophists were more professional educators than philosophers. They flourished as a result of a special need for at that time for Greek education. Prominent Sophists include Protagoras, Gorgias, Hippias, and Prodicus.

2. Socrates and his Followers

A new period of philosophy opens with the Athenian Socrates (469-399 BCE). Like the Sophists, he rejected entirely the physical speculations in which his predecessors had indulged, and made the thoughts and opinions of people his starting-point; but whereas it was the thoughts of and opinions of the individual that the Sophists took for the standard, Socrates questioned people relentlessly about their beliefs. He tried to find the definitions of the virtues, such as courage and justice, by cross-examining people who professed to have knowledge of them. His method of cross-examining people, the elenchus, did not succeed in establishing what the virtues really were, but rather it exposed the ignorance of his interlocutors.

Socrates was an enormously magnetic figure, who attracted many followers, but he also made many enemies. Socrates was executed for corrupting the youth of Athens and for disbelieving in the gods of the city. This philosophical martyrdom, however, simply made Socrates an even more iconic figure than would have been otherwise, and many later philosophical schools took Socrates as their hero.

Of Socrates' numerous disciples many either added nothing to his doctrine, or developed it in a one-sided manner, by confining themselves exclusively either to dialectic or to ethics. Thus the Athenian Xenophon contented himself, in a series of writings, with exhibiting the portrait of his master to the best of his comprehension, and added nothing original. The Megarian School, founded by Euclides of Megara, devoted themselves almost entirely to dialectic investigation of the one Good. Stilpo of Megara became the most distinguished member of the school. Ethics predominated both with the Cynics and Cyrenaics, although their positions were in direct opposition. Antisthenes of Athens, the founder of the Cynics, conceived the highest good to be the virtue which spurns every enjoyment. Cynicism continued in Greece with Menippus and on to Roman times through the efforts of Demonax and others. Aristippus of Cyrene, the founder of the Cyrenaics,considered pleasure to be the sole end in life, and regarded virtue as a good only in so far as it contributed to pleasure.

3. Plato

Both aspects of the genius of Socrates were first united in Plato of Athens (428-348 BCE), who also combined with them many the principles established by earlier philosophers, and developed the whole of this material into the unity of a comprehensive system. The groundwork of Plato's scheme, though nowhere expressly stated by him, is the threefold division of philosophy into dialectic, ethics, and physics; its central point is the theory of forms. This theory is a combination of the Eleatic doctrine of the One with Heraclitus's theory of a perpetual flux and with the Socratic method of concepts. The multitude of objects of sense, being involved in perpetual change, are thereby deprived of all genuine existence. The only true being in them is founded upon the forms, the eternal, unchangeable (independent of all that is accidental, and therefore perfect) archetypes, of which the particular objects of sense are imperfect copies. The quantity of the forms is defined by the number of universal concepts which can be derived from the particular objects of sense.

The highest form is that of the Good, which is the ultimate basis of the rest, and the first cause of being and knowledge. Apprehensions derived from the impression of sense can never give us the knowledge of true being -- i.e. of the forms. It can only be obtained by the soul's activity within itself, apart from the troubles and disturbances of sense; that is to say, by the exercise of reason. Dialectic, as the instrument in this process, leading us to knowledge of the ideas, and finally of the highest idea of the Good, is the first of sciences (scientia scientiarum). In physics, Plato adhered (though not without original modifications) to the views of the Pythagoreans, making Nature a harmonic unity in multiplicity. His ethics are founded throughout on the Socratic; with him, too, virtue is knowledge, the cognition of the supreme form of the Good. And since in this cognition the three parts of the soul -- cognitive, spirited, and appetitive -- all have their share, we get the three virtues: Wisdom, Courage, and Temperance or Continence. The bond which unites the other virtues is the virtue of Justice, by which each several part of the soul is confined to the performance of its proper function.

The school founded by Plato, called the Academy (from the name of the grove of the Attic hero Academus where he used to deliver his lectures) continued for long after. In regard to the main tendencies of its members, it was divided into the three periods of the Old, Middle, and New Academy. The chief personages in the first of these were Speusippus (son of Plato's sister), who succeeded him as the head of the school (till 339 BCE), and Xenocrates of Chalcedon (till 314 BCE). Both of them sought to fuse Pythagorean speculations on number with Plato's theory of ideas. The two other Academies were still further removed from the specific doctrines of Plato, and advocated skepticism.

4. Aristotle

The most important among Plato's disciples is Aristotle of Stagira (384-322 BCE), who shares with his master the title of the greatest philosopher of antiquity. But whereas Plato had sought to elucidate and explain things from the supra-sensual standpoint of the forms, his pupil preferred to start from the facts given us by experience. Philosophy to him meant science, and its aim was the recognition of the purpose in all things. Hence he establishes the ultimate grounds of things inductively -- that is to say, by a posteriori conclusions from a number of facts to a universal. In the series of works collected under the name of Organon, Aristotle sets forth the laws by which the human understanding effects conclusions from the particular to the knowledge of the universal.

Like Plato, he recognizes the true being of things in their concepts, but denies any separate existence of the concept apart from the particular objects of sense. They are inseparable as matter and form. In matter and form, Aristotle sees the fundamental principles of being. Matter is the basis of all that exists; it comprises the potentiality of everything, but of itself is not actually anything. A determinate thing only comes into being when the potentiality in matter is converted into actuality. This is effected by form, inherent in the unified object and the completion of the potentiality latent in the matter. Although it has no existence apart form the particulars, yet, in rank and estimation, form stands first; it is of its own nature the most knowable, the only true object of knowledge. For matter without any form cannot exist, but the essential definitions of a common form, in which are included the particular objects may be separated from matter. Form and matter are relative terms, and the lower form constitutes the matter of a higher (e.g. body, soul, reason). This series culminates in pure, immaterial form, the Deity, the origin of all motion, and therefore of the generation of actual form out of potential matter.

All motion takes place in space and time; for space is the potentiality, time the measure of the motion. Living beings are those which have in them a moving principle, or soul. In plants the function of soul is nutrition (including reproduction); in animals, nutrition and sensation; in humans, nutrition, sensation, and intellectual activity. The perfect form of the human soul is reason separated from all connection with the body, hence fulfilling its activity without the help of any corporeal organ, and so imperishable. By reason the apprehensions, which are formed in the soul by external sense-impressions, and may be true or false, are converted into knowledge. For reason alone can attain to truth either in cognition or action. Impulse towards the good is a part of human nature, and on this is founded virtue; for Aristotle does not, with Plato, regard virtue as knowledge pure and simple, but as founded on nature, habit, and reason. Of the particular virtues (of which there are as many as there are contingencies in life), each is the apprehension, by means of reason, of the proper mean between two extremes which are not virtues -- e.g. courage is the mean between cowardice and foolhardiness. The end of human activity, or the highest good, is happiness, or perfect and reasonable activity in a perfect life. To this, however, external goods are more of less necessary conditions.

The followers of Aristotle, known as Peripatetics (Theophrastus of Lesbos, Eudemus of Rhodes, Strato of Lampsacus, etc.), to a great extent abandoned metaphysical speculation, some in favor of natural science, others of a more popular treatment of ethics, introducing many changes into the Aristotelian doctrine in a naturalistic direction. A return to the views of the founder first appears among the later Peripatetics, who did good service as expositors of Aristotle's works, such as Avicenna and Averroes.

The Peripatetic School tended to make philosophy the exclusive property of the learned class, thereby depriving it of its power to benefit a wider circle. This soon produced a negative reaction, and philosophers returned to the practical standpoint of Socratic ethics. The speculations of the learned were only admitted in philosophy where serviceable for ethics. The chief consideration was how to popularize doctrines, and to provide the individual, in a time of general confusion and dissolution, with a fixed moral basis for practical life.

5. Stoicism

Such were the aims of Stoicism, founded by Athens about 310 by Zeno of Citium (in Cyprus), and brought to fuller systematic form by his successors a heads of the school, Cleanthes of Assos, and especially Chrysippus of Soli, who died about 206. Important Stoic writers of the Roman period include Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius. Their doctrines contained little that was new, seeking rather to give a practical application to the dogmas which they took ready-made from previous systems. With them philosophy is the science of the principles on which the moral life ought to be founded. The only allowable effort is towards the attainment of knowledge of human and divine things, in order to thereby regulate life. The method to lead men to true knowledge is provided by logic; physics embraces the doctrines as to the nature and organization of the universe; ethics draws from them its conclusions for practical life. Regarding Stoic logic, all knowledge originates in the real impressions of things on the senses, which the soul, being at birth a blank slate, receives in the form of presentations. These presentations, when confirmed by repeated experience, are syllogistically developed by the understanding into concepts. The test of their truth is the convincing or persuasive force with which they impress themselves upon the soul.

In physics the foundation of the Stoic doctrine was the dogma that all true being is corporeal. Within the corporeal they recognized two principles, matter and force -- that is, the material, and the Deity (logos, order, fate) permeating and informing it. Ultimately, however, the two are identical. There is nothing in the world with any independent existence: all is bound together by an unalterable chain of causation. The agreement of human action with the law of nature, of the human will with the divine will, or life according to nature, is virtue, the chief good and highest end in life. It is essentially one, the particular or cardinal virtues of Plato being only different aspects of it; it is completely sufficient for happiness, and incapable of any differences of degree. All good actions are absolutely equal in merit, and so are all bad actions. All that lies between virtue and vice is neither good nor bad; at most, it is distinguished as preferable, undesirable, or absolutely indifferent. Virtue is fully possessed only by the wise person, who is no way inferior in worth to Zeus; he is lord over his own life, and may end it by his own free choice. In general, the prominent characteristic of Stoic philosophy is moral heroism, often verging on asceticism.

6. Epicureanism

The same goal which was aimed at in Stoicism was also approached, from a diametrically opposite position, in the system founded about the same time by Epicurus, of the deme Gargettus in Attica (342-268), who brought it to completion himself. Epicureanism, like Stoicism, is connected with previous systems. Like Stoicism, it is also practical in its ends, proposing to find in reason and knowledge the secret of a happy life, and admitting abstruse learning only where it serves the ends of practical wisdom. Hence, logic (called by Epicurus (kanonikon), or the doctrine of canons of truth) is made entirely subservient to physics, physics to ethics. The standards of knowledge and canons of truth in theoretical matters are the impressions of the senses, which are true and indisputable, together with the presentations formed from such impressions, and opinions extending beyond those impressions, in so far as they are supported or not contradicted by the evidence of the senses. In practical questions the feelings of pleasure and pain are the tests. Epicurus's physics, in which he follows in essentials the materialistic system of Democritus, are intended to refer all phenomena to a natural cause, in order that a knowledge of nature may set men free from the bondage of disquieting superstitions.

In ethics he followed within certain limits the Cyrenaic doctrine, conceiving the highest good to be happiness, and happiness to be found in pleasure, to which the natural impulses of every being are directed. But the aim is not with him, as it is with the Cyrenaics, the pleasure of the moment, but the enduring condition of pleasure, which, in its essence, is freedom from the greatest of evils, pain. Pleasures and pains are, however, distinguished not merely in degree, but in kind. The renunciation of a pleasure or endurance of a pain is often a means to a greater pleasure; and since pleasures of sense are subordinate to the pleasures of the mind, the undisturbed peace of the mind is a higher good than the freedom of the body from pain. Virtue is desirable not for itself, but for the sake of pleasure of mind, which it secures by freeing people from trouble and fear and moderating their passions and appetites. The cardinal virtue is prudence, which is shown by true insight in calculation the consequences of our actions as regards pleasure or pain.

7. Skepticism

The practical tendency of Stoicism and Epicureanism, seen in the search for happiness, is also apparent in the Skeptical School founded by Pyrrho of Elis (about 365-275 BCE). Pyrrho disputes the possibility of attaining truth by sensory apprehension, reason, or the two combined, and thence infers the necessity of total suspension of judgment on things. Thus can we attain release from all bondage to theories, a condition which is followed, like a shadow, by that imperturbable state of mind which is the foundation of true happiness. Pyrrho's immediate disciple was Timon. Pyrrho's doctrine was adopted by the Middle and New Academies (see above), represented by Arcesilaus of Pitane (316-241 BCE) and Carneades of Cyrene (214-129 BCE) respectively. Both attacked the Stoics for asserting a criterion of truth in our knowledge; although their views were indeed skeptical, they seem to have considered that what they were maintaining was a genuine tenet of Socrates and Plato.

The latest Academics, such as Antiochus of Ascalon (about 80 BCE), fused with Platonism certain Peripatetic and many Stoic dogmas, thus making way for Eclecticism, to which all later antiquity tended after Greek philosophy had spread itself over the Roman world. Roman philosophy, thus, becomes an extension of the Greek tradition. After the Christian era Pythagoreanism, in a resuscitated form, again takes its place among the more important systems. Pyrrhonian skepticism was also re-introduced by Aenesidemus, and developed further by Sextus Empiricus. But the preeminence of this period belongs to Platonism, which is notably represented in the works of Plutarch of Chaeronea and the physician Galen.

8. Neoplatonism

The closing period of Greek philosophy is marked in the third century CE. by the establishment of Neoplatonism in Rome. Its founder was Plotinus of Lycopolis in Egypt (205-270) and its emphasis is a scientific philosophy of religion, in which the doctrine of Plato is fused with the most important elements in the Aristotelian and Stoic systems and with Eastern speculations. At the summit of existences stands the One or the Good, as the source of all things. It emanates from itself, as if from the reflection of its own being, reason, wherein is contained the infinite store of ideas. Soul, the copy of the reason, is emanated by and contained in it, as reason is in the One, and, by informing matter in itself non-existence, constitutes bodies whose existence is contained in soul. Nature, therefore, is a whole, endowed with life and soul. Soul, being chained to matter, longs to escape from the bondage of the body and return to its original source. In virtue and philosophic thought soul had the power to elevate itself above the reason into a state of ecstasy, where it can behold, or ascend up to, that one good primary Being whom reason cannot know. To attain this union with the Good, or God, is the true function of humans, to whom the external world should be absolutely indifferent.

Plotinus's most important disciple, the Syrian Porphyry, contented himself with popularizing his master's doctrine. But the school if Iamblichus, a disciple of Porphyry, effected a change in the position of Neoplatonism, which now took up the cause of polytheism against Christianity, and adopted for this purpose every conceivable form of superstition, especially those of the East. Foiled in the attempt to resuscitate the old beliefs, its supporters then turned with fresh ardor to scientific work, and especially to the study of Plato and Aristotle, in the interpretation of whose works they rendered great services. The last home of philosophy was at Athens, where Proclus (411-485) sought to reduce to a kind of system the whole mass of philosophic tradition, until in 529 CE, the teaching of philosophy at Athens was forbidden by Justinian.

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Xenophanes (c. 570—c. 478 B.C.E.)

xenophanesXenophanes of Colophon was a traveling poet and sage with philosophical leanings who lived in ancient Greece during the sixth and the beginning of the fifth centuries B.C.E. There are a significant number of surviving fragments for such an early figure, and the poetic verses available to us indicate a broad range of issues. These include comments on religion, knowledge, the natural world, the proper comportment at a banquet, as well as other social teachings and commentary.

Despite his varying interests, he is most commonly remembered for his critiques of popular religion, particularly false conceptions of the divine that are a byproduct of the human propensity to anthropomorphize deities. According to Xenophanes, humans have been severely mislead by this tendency, as well as the scriptures of the day, and he seemed intent on leading his audience toward a perspective on religion that is based more on rationality and less on traditionally held beliefs.  His theological contributions were not merely negative, however, for he also presented comments that support the notion of divine goodness, and many have speculated that he may have been the first monotheist, or even pantheist, in the Western intellectual tradition. The possibility that Xenophanes endorsed the perspective of divine unity led Plato and Aristotle to designate him as the founder of the Eleatic school of philosophy, and some have classified him (though probably erroneously) as having been Parmenides’ teacher.

Many of Xenophanes’ poetic lines are concerned with the physical world and the fragments show some very inventive attempts to demythologize various heavenly phenomena. An example of this is his claim that a rainbow is nothing but a cloud. He also postulated that earth and water are the fundamental “stuffs” of nature and, based in part on his observations of fossils, he held the view that our world has gone through alternating periods of extreme wetness and dryness.

Another area in which Xenophanes made some seminal comments is epistemology. In addition to endorsing a critical rationality toward religious claims, he encouraged a general humility and skepticism toward all knowledge claims and he attempted to discourage dogmatic arrogance.

Table of Contents

  1. Life, Works and Significance
  2. Social Commentary and Criticism
  3. Religious Views
    1. Critique of Greek Religion
    2. Divine Goodness
    3. The Nature of the Divine
      1. Was Xenophanes a Monotheist?
      2. Was Xenophanes an Immaterialist?
      3. Was Xenophanes a Pantheist?
  4. Natural and Scientific Views
    1. Earth and Water as Fundamental
    2. Demythologizing Heavenly Phenomena
  5. Critique of Knowledge
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life, Works and Significance

Xenophanes was from a small town of Colophon in Ionia and most recent scholars place the date of his birth sometime around 570-560 B.C.E. He appeared to live into his nineties, thereby placing his death sometime after 478 B.C.E. This is indicated by the following lines from one of Xenophanes’ remaining fragments, which shows him to still be writing poetry at ninety-two years of age:

Already there are seven and sixty years
tossing about my counsel throughout the land of Greece,
and from my birth up till then there were twenty and five to add to these,
if I know how to speak truly concerning these things. (frag. 8)

He seems to have left his home at an early age and spent much of his life wandering around Greece, often reciting his poetry at the appropriate functions and gatherings.

There are 45 remaining fragments of Xenophanes’ poetry and testimonia about Xenophanes that have been collected from a wide range of sources. The fragments are in the form of poetic verse, primarily in hexameters and elegiac meter. A few ancient authors contend that Xenophanes also wrote a treatise entitled, “On Nature,” but such sources do not appear to be credible. Nonetheless, the existing fragments comprise a rather significant collection of work for an early Greek philosopher. In fact, Xenophanes is the first Pre-Socratic philosopher for whom we have a significant amount of preserved text. While this amount of material has been helpful in determining the various themes and concerns of Xenophanes, there are still wide ranging opinions on the fundamental tenets of his philosophy. “Perhaps the greatest impediment to a consistent understanding of Xenophanes’ philosophy,” states J.H. Lesher, “is the frequent disparity between the opinions he expressed in his poems and those attributed to him in the testimonia.” (7)

There is some debate as to whether Xenophanes ought to be included in the philosophical canon and it is the case that in some surveys of ancient Greek or Pre-Socratic philosophy, Xenophanes is left out altogether. Many scholars have classified him as basically a poet or a theologian, or even an irrational mystic. There are several issues working against Xenophanes in this regard. He apparently did not attract a large number of followers or disciples to his philosophy. He was not treated particularly favorably by Plato or Aristotle. Plus, given the poetical and polemical nature of the various fragments, it is also true that Xenophanes did not leave us with anything resembling a rational justification or argument for some of his claims, which is the sort of thing one would expect from a philosopher, no matter how early. Nonetheless, to disregard Xenophanes as a serious philosophical figure would be shortsighted. He did leave us with some rather seminal and interesting contributions to the history of thought. While it is true that Xenophanes may not fit into any precise mold or pattern of justification which would classify him as a philosopher of note, the man and his fragments are deserving of serious philosophical consideration.

2. Social Commentary and Criticism

Much like Socrates, the “gadfly of Athens,” whom he preceded by over one hundred years, one picture of Xenophanes that emerges in several of the fragments is that of social critic. Much of Xenophanes’ verse was likely intended for performance at social gatherings and functions as he “tossed about, bearing [him]self from city to city”  (frag 45). In fragment 1 we find a detailed account of a feast that ends with a call to proper behavior.

And having poured a libation and prayed to be able to do
what is right—for these are obvious—
it is not wrong to drink as much as allows any but an aged man
to reach his home without a servants aid.
Praise the man who when he has taken drink brings noble deeds to light,
As memory and a striving for virtue bring to him.

This suggests that while he was welcome among circles of people who had access to the finer things in life he also felt it his duty to encourage them to comport themselves with piety and moderation. Elsewhere, we find Xenophanes implying a connection between the downfall of his hometown with her citizen’s ostentatious displays of wealth (frag 3). In another of the lengthy surviving fragments, we find a critique of cultural priorities that like minds have echoed throughout history. Here Xenophanes bemoans the rewards and reverence afforded champion athletes while the expertise of the learned and the poets goes unheeded and unappreciated.

For our expertise is better than the strength of men and horses.
But this practice makes no sense nor is it right
to prefer strength to this good expertise.
For neither if there were a good boxer among the people
nor if there were a pentathlete or wrestler
nor again if there were someone swift afoot—
which is most honoured of all men’s deeds of strength—
would for this reason a city be better governed.
Small joy would a city have from this—
If someone were to be victorious in competing for a prize on Pisa’s banks—
For these do not enrich a city’s treasure room. (frag. 2)

3. Religious Views

a. Critique of Greek Religion

Xenophanes is the first Greek figure that we know of to provide a set of theological assertions and he is perhaps best remembered for his critique of Greek popular religion, specifically the tendency to anthropomorphize deities. In rather bold fashion, Xenophanes takes to task the scripture of his day for rendering the gods in such a negative and erroneous light.

Homer and Hesiod have attributed to the gods
all sorts of things which are matters of reproach and censure among men:
theft, adultery and mutual deceit. (frag. 11)

This line of criticism against the primary teachers of Greece clearly resonated with Socrates and Plato where Xenophanes’ influence can especially be seen in the Euthyphro and book two of the Republic. In another set of passages, which are probably the most commonly cited of Xenophanes’ fragments, we find a series of argumentatively styled passages against the human propensity to create gods in our own image:

But mortals suppose that gods are born,
wear their own clothes and have a voice and body. (frag. 14)
Ethiopians say that their gods are snub-nosed and black;
Thracians that theirs are blue-eyed and red-haired. (frag. 16)
But if horses or oxen or lions had hands
or could draw with their hands and accomplish such works as men,
horses would draw the figures of the gods as similar to horses, and the oxen as similar to oxen,
and they would make the bodies
of the sort which each of them had. (frag. 15)

While Xenophanes is obviously targeting our predisposition to anthropomorphize here, he is also being critical of the tendency of religiously-minded people to privilege their own belief systems over others for no sound reasons. This would have been particularly true of the Greeks of Xenophanes’ time who considered their religious views superior to those of barbarians. As Richard McKirihan notes, when held up to the critical light of reason, “Greek, ‘barbarian’, and hypothetical bovine views of the gods are put on an even footing and cancel each other out, leaving no grounds to prefer one over the others. This brings them all equally into question.” (74) This does not imply that Xenophanes considered all religious views to be equivalent, but rather it seems to indicate that he is concerned with leading his Greek audience toward a perspective on religion that is based more on rationality and less on traditionally held beliefs. So then, what would a more rational perspective on religion entail? Here Xenophanes offers up a number of theological insights, both negative and positive.

b. Divine Goodness

As we have seen in fragment 11, Xenophanes upheld the notion that immorality cannot be associated with a deity. But while Xenophanes is clearly against the portrayals of the Olympian gods performing illicit deeds, it is less clear as to why he would maintain such a thesis. There are two possible readings of this. One could first say that, given Xenophanes critique of anthropomorphizing that is discussed above, he believes that it would make no sense to ascribe to the gods any sort of human behaviors or characteristics, be they illicit or praiseworthy. On this reading, Xenophanes should be seen as a type of mystic. Another interpretation, which is more likely, is that Xenophanes upheld the notion of divine perfection and goodness. It is true that Xenophanes never explicitly states such a position.  However, as Lesher points out, such a thesis is attributed to him by Simplicius, and the belief in the inherent goodness of the gods or god was a widely shared conviction among many Greek philosophers. (84) Furthermore, such an interpretation would square with Xenophanes’ assertion that it is “good always to hold the gods in high regard.” (frag. 1)

c. The Nature of the Divine

While it seems clear that Xenophanes advocated the moral goodness of the divine, some of his other theological assertions are more difficult to discern. There have been a rather wide range of arguments by scholars that commit Xenophanes to any number of theological positions. Some scholars have maintained that he was the first Greek philosopher to advocate monotheism while others have argued that Xenophanes was clearly supporting Olympian polytheism. Some have attributed pantheism to Xenophanes while others have maintained that he is essentially an atheist or materialist. Given such a wide discrepancy, it will perhaps be helpful to first list the fundamental fragments and then move on to the possible specifics of Xenophanes’ theology.

One god is greatest among gods and men,
Not at all like mortals in body or in thought. (frag. 23)
…whole he sees, whole he thinks, and whole he hears. (frag. 24)
…but completely without toil he shakes all things by the thought of his mind. (frag. 25)
…always he abides in the same place, not moving at all,
nor is it seemly for him to travel to different places at different times. (frag. 26)

i. Was Xenophanes a Monotheist?

At first glance, the opening line of fragment 23 could be read as a pronouncement of monotheism and a rejection of Greek polytheism. If so, Xenophanes would have been the first Greek thinker to espouse such a revolutionary theological perspective. While the phrasing “one god greatest among gods” [emphasis mine] would seem to contradict monotheism on the face of it, scholars from both sides of the debate recognize that this is not an endorsement of polytheism by Xenophanes. Rather it should be seen as a “polar expression,” which is a poetic device used to emphasize a point and does not imply the existence of things at either pole. Nor should the fact that Xenophanes utilizes the term “gods” throughout the available fragments be seen as an endorsement of polytheism in and of itself. It is highly likely that Xenophanes is simply utilizing the common vernacular to speak of the divine. So the question remains, was Xenophanes a monotheist?

A great number of traditional and modern sources have attributed monotheism to Xenophanes and fragments 23-26 would seem to indicate the potential merit of such an assumption. Some have gone as far as to say that not only was he the first monotheist, but he was also the first to advocate a radical form of monotheism which insists that the one god is pure spirit and is completely distinct from the world. In recent years, the staunchest advocate of the monotheistic interpretation has been Jonathan Barnes who extends Xenophanes’ rationalistic critique of religion to its natural end: “Xenophanes, I conclude, was a monotheist, as the long tradition has it; and he was an a priori monotheist; like later Christian theologians, he argued on purely logical grounds that there could not be a plurality of gods.” (92) Given such an interpretation, Barnes maintains that the enigmatic opening line of fragment 23 should be paraphrased to read, “There is one god, since (by definition) a god is greater than anything else, whether god or man.” (92) Other scholars have ascribed a softer form of monotheism to Xenophanes, maintaining that while he does not seem to completely abandon polytheism explicitly, he does so implicitly.

While the designation of Xenophanes as a monotheist is warranted in many respects, such an interpretation ultimately presumes too much. Given the fact that monotheism would have been a radical departure from traditional Greek beliefs, we would assume that Xenophanes would have taken more pains to differentiate and clarify his viewpoint. For one thing, it is highly suspicious that, while he takes Homer and Hesiod to task for their portrayal of the nature of the gods, he never bothers to comment on the number of their gods. Furthermore, a true monotheist would not likely be so cavalier about his use of the plural ‘gods’ in a polythesitic society. It is likely that later commentators and scholars have been somewhat biased in their attempts to find in Xenophanes the early articulations of a now commonly held religious perspective. Guthrie puts the matter in perspective: “…it must be understood that the question of monotheism or polytheism, which is of vital religious importance to the Christian, Jew or Muslim, never had the same prominence in the Greek mind.” (375) As such, the best summary of the complexity of the monotheistic question is presented to us by Lesher: “The fragments warrant attributing to Xenophanes the novel idea of a single god of unusual power, consciousness, and cosmic influence, but not the stronger view that beyond this one god there could be nothing else worthy of the name.” (99)

ii. Was Xenophanes an Immaterialist?

In the second line of fragment 23, Xenophanes declares that god is unlike mortals “in body and thought.” Although some of the ancient testimonia have interpreted this to mean that god lacks a body, this should not be read as an attempt by Xenophanes to put forth the claim that the divine is incorporeal, for it would be some time before the concept of an existing thing that is completely immaterial would develop. As McKirahan, notes, “the fifth-century atomists were the first presocratics clearly to conceive of an immaterial, noncorporeal existing thing, and this idea came only with difficulty.” (63) Rather than reading these lines as an expression of the incorporeal nature of the divine, these passages should be interpreted as a continuation of Xenophanes’ efforts to correct the mistaken conceptions of divine nature that have been passed on from Homer and Hesiod. In fragment 25, for example, Xenophanes introduces a god who effortlessly, “shakes all things by the thought of his mind.” Readers or hearers of this passage would immediately recognize Xenophanes’ dramatic corollary to a famous portrayal of Zeus in the Illiad who simply shakes his head to display his will and power. By contrast, a truly supreme god exerts will and power without any toil whatsoever, according to Xenophanes.

iii. Was Xenophanes a Pantheist?

If Xenophanes cannot be read as an immaterialist then we may rightly question what sort of body “unlike mortals” can be attributed to the divine? Numerous writers, both ancient and modern, attribute to Xenophanes the viewpoint that god is spherical and identical with the universe. In Cicero’s Prior Academics, for example we find the following passage: “(Xenophanes said that) all things are one, that this is unchanging, and is god, that this never came into being and is eternal, and has a spherical shape.” (2.18) In another source, Theodoretus’ Treatment of Greek Afflictions, we find this statement: “Accordingly Xenophanes, the son of Orthomenes from Colophon, leader of the Eleatic School, said that the whole is one, spherical, and limited, not generated but eternally and totally motionless.” (4.5) More recently, Guthrie concludes after a careful analysis of recent texts that, “for Xenophanes the cosmos was a spherical body, living, conscious, and divine, the cause of its own internal movements and change. He was in the Ionian tradition.” (382)

One should not contradict such formidable scholarship lightly, but the fact of the matter is that there is no basis for the spherical/pantheistic interpretation in the fragments that are available to us. In fact, it is difficult to square the claims of pantheism with fragment 25, in which god “shakes all things by the thought of his mind;” it is perhaps even trickier to square the notion of a spherical god with another one of Xenophanes’ fragments in which he declares, “The upper limit of the earth is seen here at our feet, pushing up against the air, but that below goes on without limits” (frag. 28). Lesher, who has provided us with the most balanced and careful analysis of this question in recent years, makes a convincing case that the development of the spherical/pantheistic interpretation was “spawned in part by a confused assimilation of Xenophanes’ philosophy with that of Parmenides, misled by superficial similarities between Xenophanes’ god and Parmenides’ one ‘Being,’ and relying on an overly optimistic reading of some cryptic comments by Plato (Sophist 242c-d) and Aristotle (Metaphysics 986b10ff)” (100-101). In other words, the doxographical tradition seems to be guilty of viewing Xenophanes’ conception of the divine through a series of lenses that, when stacked upon each other, distort the original picture.

4. Natural and Scientific Views

The physical theories of Xenophanes have been ignored in much of the ancient literature, due in large part to the influence of Aristotle. According to The Philosopher, Xenophanes is to be classified as a theological theorist rather than a student of nature. As the fragments indicate, however, Xenophanes was indeed quite interested in theorizing about the natural world, and while his ideas are rather rudimentary by current standards, they do show a level of sophistication and coherence not always appreciated by his successors. As Lesher indicates: “We must then recognize the distinct possibility that Aristotle failed to mention Xenophanes’ physical views not because there were none to mention but because Aristotle regarded Xenophanes as insufficiently interested and engaged in physical theorizing to warrant discussion.” (127) Another reason for the disregard is that Xenophanes did not provide the kind of teleologically based insights into the natural phenomena that successors such as Plato and Aristotle would have desired. In any case, the physical theories of Xenophanes deserve more serious attention than they have been afforded historically.

a. Earth and Water as Fundamental

Xenophanes’ speculations on the physical world need to be understood within the context of his predecessors, the Milesian philosophers (Thales, Anaximenes, Anaximander). As the first metaphysicians, the Milesians attempted to determine the first principle or arche of reality. To briefly summarize for our purposes here, each of the Milesians postulated one primary principle (arche) as the source of everything else. For Thales, the arche was water. For Anaximenes, air was fundamental and all the other apparent “stuffs” of reality could be accounted for by a principle of condensation and rarefaction. For Anaximander, none of the traditional elements would suffice, and he identified the source of all things as a boundless or indefinite stuff termed apeiron.

Xenophanes sought to expand and improve upon the work of his predecessors, and instead of limiting his speculations to one stuff, or substance, his theory is based upon the interplay of two substances, earth and water. “All things that come into being and grow are earth and water.” (frag. 29) According to the historical sources, Xenophanes seems to have held that the opposition of wet and dry in the world is the preeminent explanatory basis for the phenomena of the natural world. In Hippolytus’ Refutation of All Heresies (1.14), for example, we are told that Xenophanes held that the history of the natural world has been a continually alternating process of extreme dryness and wetness. At the point of extreme wetness, the earth sinks completely into mud and all humans perish. Once the world begins to dry out there is a period of regeneration in which life on earth begins again. Xenophanes developed this theory based upon a wide variety of empirical evidence, particularly his examination of fossils. Again, a key source for this is Hippolytus, who discussed how Xenophanes gathered the proof for this thesis from the existence of various fossilized imprints of sea creatures as well as sea shells that are found far inland. It should be noted that what is significant about his viewpoint is not so much the conclusion at which he arrives, but rather the process he utilizes to support it. Prior thinkers had speculated on the possibility that the earth had been reduced to mud, but Xenophanes seems to have been the first to provide empirical evidence coupled with deduction to support and develop his theory. Thus, not only was Xenophanes probably “the first to draw attention to the real significance of fossils” (Kirk 177), we also find in him the beginnings of a scientific methodology.

b. Demythologizing Heavenly Phenomena

Although we do not have much by way of direct statements from Xenophanes, there is a good deal of ancient testimonia that references his astronomical and meteorological views, particularly his emphasis on the clouds and their explanatory role for various phenomena. According to a variety of sources, Xenophanes seems to have held the view that the sun comes into being—perhaps newly each day—either by a collection of ignited clouds (according to some) or by pieces of fiery earth. Students of early Greek philosophy will recognize the similarity to Heraclitus in this theory. It is commonly accepted that Xenophanes was an influential figure in the development of Heraclitus’ ideas. As such it is somewhat difficult to determine whether Xenophanes position here is authentic, or whether the ancient sources are reading Xenophanes through Heraclitus. Nevertheless, the historical speculation seems somewhat justified, particularly given the fact that Xenophanes proposed the view that the clouds were responsible for various heavenly phenomena. A key passage in this regard is fragment 32, where Xenophanes explains a rainbow: “And she whom they call Iris, this too is by nature a cloud, purple, red and greenish-yellow to behold.” Other instances where Xenophanes provides a natural explanation for what had been considered supernatural manifestations are in reference to stars as well as the phenomenon known as St. Elmo’s Fire (or Dioscuri) which is produced by glimmering clouds.

Further evidence of Xenophanes’ demythologizing tendencies occurs in the following passage:
The sea is the source of water and of wind,
for without the great sea there would be no wind
nor streams of rivers nor rainwater from on high;
but the great sea is the begetter of clouds, winds,
and rivers. (frag. 30)

It would have been natural for someone who had lived his life around bodies of water to make several observations about streams, winds and mists. What is lacking from Xenophanes and the traditional accounts is any clear explanation for why he held these beliefs. Why, for instance, did he think that the sea produced clouds and wind? Thus, as a purely scientific account, Xenophanes’ theory is lacking. Nevertheless, the true significance of this fragment becomes evident when it is read against the backdrop of Homeric poetry. As such, the true significance lies not in what the lines attempt to explain, but rather in what they attempt to explain away. “Without explicitly announcing their banishment,” As Lesher indicates, “Xenophanes has dispatched an array of traditional sea, river, cloud, wind, and rain deities (hence Zeus himself) to the explanatory sidelines.” (137) While Xenophanes is repeating ideas that had earlier been developed by Anaximander and Anaximenes, it is significant that he is carrying forward the criticism of traditional Homeric notions, particularly lines in the Iliad, “which characterize Oceanus as the source of all water—rivers, sea, springs and wells—and they declare that the sea is the source not only of rivers but also of rain wind and clouds.” (Guthrie  391). Ironically, Xenophanes’ value free speculations on the natural world, while a goal of scientific inquiry today, guaranteed that his physical theorizing would be disregarded by Plato and Aristotle.

5. Critique of Knowledge

According to many scholars, none of what Xenophanes has said up to this point would qualify him as a philosopher in the strict sense. It is Xenophanes’ contribution to epistemology, however, that ultimately seems to have earned him a place in the philosophical canon from a traditional standpoint. We have already seen how Xenophanes applies a critical rationality to the divine claims of his contemporaries, but he also advanced a skeptical outlook toward human knowledge in general.

…and of course the clear and certain truth no man has seen
nor will there be anyone who knows about the gods and what I say about all things.
For even if, in the best case, one happened to speak just of what has been brought to pass,
still he himself would not know. But opinion is allotted to all. (frag. 34)

If these statements are to be read—per many of the later skeptics—as a blanket claim that would render all positions meaningless, then it is difficult to see how anything Xenophanes has said up to this point should be taken with any seriousness or sincerity. How could Xenophanes put forth this kind of skepticism and be assured that the poets were wrong to portray the gods the way that they have, for instance? As such, a more charitable interpretation of these lines would seem to be in order.

A better reading of Xenophanes’ skeptical statements is to see them not as an attack on the possibility of knowledge per se, but rather as a charge against arrogance and dogmatism, particularly with regard to matters that we cannot directly experience. The human realm of knowledge is limited by what can be observed. “If,” for example, “god had not made yellow honey [we] would think that figs were much sweeter.” (frag. 38)  Therefore, broad based speculations on the workings of the divine and the cosmos are ultimately matters of opinion. Although some “opinions” would seem to square better with how things ought to be understood through rational thinking and our experiences of the world (keeping with Xenophanes’ earlier statements against the poets), any thoughts on such matters should be tempered by humility. Accordingly, F.R. Pickering notes, “Xenophanes is a natural epistemologist, who claims that statements concerning the non-evident realm of the divine as well as the far-reaching generalizations of natural sciences cannot be known with certainty but must remain the objects of opinion.” (233) Unfortunately, Xenophanes does not develop his critical empiricism, nor does he explain or examine how our various opinions might receive further justification. Still, just as the poet philosopher has provided us with some meaningful warnings toward our tendency to anthropomorphize our deities, the poet philosopher is also warning us against our natural human proclivity to confuse dogmatism with piety.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers: Volume 1. London, Henley and Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1979.
  • Classen, C. Joachim. “Xenophanes and the Tradition of Epic Poetry.” Ionian Philosophy. Ed. K.J. Boudouris. Athens: International Association for Greek Philosophy: International Center for Greek Philosophy and Culture, 1989: 91-103.
  • Cleve, Felix M. The Giants of Pre-Sophistic Greek Philosophy. Vol 1. 2nd ed. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1969.
  • Fränkel, Hermann. “Xenophanes’ Empiricism and His Critique of Knowledge.” The Presocratics: A Collection of Critical Essays. Ed. Alexander P.D. Mourelatos. Garden City, N.Y.: Anchor Press Doubleday, 1974: 118-31.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. A History of Greek Philosophy. Vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1965.
  • Kirk, G.S., J.E. Raven and M. Schofield. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd ed. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • Lesher, J.H. Xeonphanes of Colophon: Fragments: A Text and Translation with Commentary. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1992.
    • Lesher provides an excellent translation, commentary and analysis of Xenophanes. This is most thorough and balanced treatment of Xenophanes available in English.
  • Lesher, J.H. “Xenophanes’ Skepticism.” Essays in Ancient Greek Philosophy. Vol. 2. Albany, N.Y.: SUNY Press, 1983: 20-40
  • McKirahan, Richard D. Philosophy before Socrates. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1994.
  • Pickering, F.R. “Xenophanes.” The Classical Review. Vol. 43, No. 2. 1993: 232-233.
  • Stokes, Michael C. One and Many in Presocratic Philosophy. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1971.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. “Theology and Philosophy in Early Greek Thought.” The Philosophical Quarterly. Vol. 2, No. 7. 1952: 97-123.

Author Information

Michael Patzia
Central College
U. S. A.

Plato (427—347 B.C.E.)

platoPlato is one of the world's best known and most widely read and studied philosophers. He was the student of Socrates and the teacher of Aristotle, and he wrote in the middle of the fourth century B.C.E. in ancient Greece. Though influenced primarily by Socrates, to the extent that Socrates is usually the main character in many of Plato's writings, he was also influenced by Heraclitus, Parmenides, and the Pythagoreans.

There are varying degrees of controversy over which of Plato's works are authentic, and in what order they were written, due to their antiquity and the manner of their preservation through time. Nonetheless, his earliest works are generally regarded as the most reliable of the ancient sources on Socrates, and the character Socrates that we know through these writings is considered to be one of the greatest of the ancient philosophers.

Plato's middle to later works, including his most famous work, the Republic, are generally regarded as providing Plato's own philosophy, where the main character in effect speaks for Plato himself. These works blend ethics, political philosophy, moral psychology, epistemology, and metaphysics into an interconnected and systematic philosophy. It is most of all from Plato that we get the theory of Forms, according to which the world we know through the senses is only an imitation of the pure, eternal, and unchanging world of the Forms. Plato's works also contain the origins of the familiar complaint that the arts work by inflaming the passions, and are mere illusions. We also are introduced to the ideal of "Platonic love:" Plato saw love as motivated by a longing for the highest Form of beauty—The Beautiful Itself, and love as the motivational power through which the highest of achievements are possible. Because they tended to distract us into accepting less than our highest potentials, however, Plato mistrusted and generally advised against physical expressions of love.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
    1. Birth
    2. Family
    3. Early Travels and the Founding of the Academy
    4. Later Trips to Sicily and Death
  2. Influences on Plato
    1. Heraclitus
    2. Parmenides and Zeno
    3. The Pythagoreans
    4. Socrates
  3. Plato's Writings
    1. Plato's Dialogues and the Historical Socrates
    2. Dating Plato's Dialogues
    3. Transmission of Plato's Works
  4. Other Works Attributed to Plato
    1. Spuria
    2. Epigrams
    3. Dubia
  5. The Early Dialogues
    1. Historical Accuracy
    2. Plato's Characterization of Socrates
    3. Ethical Positions in the Early Dialogues
    4. Psychological Positions in the Early Dialogues
    5. Religious Positions in the Early Dialogues
    6. Methodological and Epistemological Positions in the Early Dialogues
  6. The Middle Dialogues
    1. Differences between the Early and Middle Dialogues
    2. The Theory of Forms
    3. Immortality and Reincarnation
    4. Moral Psychology
    5. Critique of the Arts
    6. Platonic Love
  7. Late Transitional and Late Dialogues
    1. Philosophical Methodology
    2. Critique of the Earlier Theory of Forms
    3. The Myth of Atlantis
    4. The Creation of the Universe
    5. The Laws
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Greek Texts
    2. Translations Into English
    3. Plato's Socrates and the Historical Socrates
    4. Socrates and Plato's Early Period Dialogues
    5. General Books on Plato

1. Biography

a. Birth

It is widely accepted that Plato, the Athenian philosopher, was born in 428-7 B.C.E and died at the age of eighty or eighty-one at 348-7 B.C.E. These dates, however, are not entirely certain, for according to Diogenes Laertius (D.L.), following Apollodorus' chronology, Plato was born the year Pericles died, was six years younger than Isocrates, and died at the age of eighty-four (D.L. 3.2-3.3). If Plato's date of death is correct in Apollodorus' version, Plato would have been born in 430 or 431. Diogenes' claim that Plato was born the year Pericles died would put his birth in 429. Later (at 3.6), Diogenes says that Plato was twenty-eight when Socrates was put to death (in 399), which would, again, put his year of birth at 427. In spite of the confusion, the dates of Plato's life we gave above, which are based upon Eratosthenes' calculations, have traditionally been accepted as accurate.

b. Family

Little can be known about Plato's early life. According to Diogenes, whose testimony is notoriously unreliable, Plato's parents were Ariston and Perictione (or Potone—see D. L. 3.1). Both sides of the family claimed to trace their ancestry back to Poseidon (D.L. 3.1). Diogenes' report that Plato's birth was the result of Ariston's rape of Perictione (D.L. 3.1) is a good example of the unconfirmed gossip in which Diogenes so often indulges. We can be confident that Plato also had two older brothers, Glaucon and Adeimantus, and a sister, Potone, by the same parents (see D.L. 3.4). (W. K. C. Guthrie, A History of Greek Philosophy, vol. 4, 10 n. 4 argues plausibly that Glaucon and Adeimantus were Plato's older siblings.) After Ariston's death, Plato's mother married her uncle, Pyrilampes (in Plato's Charmides, we are told that Pyrilampes was Charmides' uncle, and Charmides was Plato's mother's brother), with whom she had another son, Antiphon, Plato's half-brother (see Plato, Parmenides 126a-b).

Plato came from one of the wealthiest and most politically active families in Athens. Their political activities, however, are not seen as laudable ones by historians. One of Plato's uncles (Charmides) was a member of the notorious "Thirty Tyrants," who overthrew the Athenian democracy in 404 B.C.E. Charmides' own uncle, Critias, was the leader of the Thirty. Plato's relatives were not exclusively associated with the oligarchic faction in Athens, however. His stepfather Pyrilampes was said to have been a close associate of Pericles, when he was the leader of the democratic faction.

Plato's actual given name was apparently Aristocles, after his grandfather. "Plato" seems to have started as a nickname (for platos, or "broad"), perhaps first given to him by his wrestling teacher for his physique, or for the breadth of his style, or even the breadth of his forehead (all given in D.L. 3.4). Although the name Aristocles was still given as Plato's name on one of the two epitaphs on his tomb (see D.L. 3.43), history knows him as Plato.

c. Early Travels and the Founding of the Academy

When Socrates died, Plato left Athens, staying first in Megara, but then going on to several other places, including perhaps Cyrene, Italy, Sicily, and even Egypt. Strabo (17.29) claims that he was shown where Plato lived when he visited Heliopolis in Egypt. Plato occasionally mentions Egypt in his works, but not in ways that reveal much of any consequence (see, for examples, Phaedrus 274c-275b; Philebus 19b).

Better evidence may be found for his visits to Italy and Sicily, especially in the Seventh Letter. According to the account given there, Plato first went to Italy and Sicily when he was "about forty" (324a). While he stayed in Syracuse, he became the instructor to Dion, brother-in-law of the tyrant Dionysius I. According to doubtful stories from later antiquity, Dionysius became annoyed with Plato at some point during this visit, and arranged to have the philosopher sold into slavery (Diod. 15.7; Plut. Dion 5; D.L. 3.19-21).

In any event, Plato returned to Athens and founded a school, known as the Academy. (This is where we get our word, "academic." The Academy got its name from its location, a grove of trees sacred to the hero Academus—or Hecademus [see D.L. 3.7]—a mile or so outside the Athenian walls; the site can still be visited in modern Athens, but visitors will find it depressingly void of interesting monuments or features.) Except for two more trips to Sicily, the Academy seems to have been Plato's home base for the remainder of his life.

d. Later Trips to Sicily and Death

The first of Plato's remaining two Sicilian adventures came after Dionysius I died and his young son, Dionysius II, ascended to the throne. His uncle/brother-in-law Dion persuaded the young tyrant to invite Plato to come to help him become a philosopher-ruler of the sort described in the Republic. Although the philosopher (now in his sixties) was not entirely persuaded of this possibility (Seventh Letter 328b-c), he agreed to go. This trip, like the last one, however, did not go well at all. Within months, the younger Dionysius had Dion sent into exile for sedition (Seventh Letter 329c, Third Letter 316c-d), and Plato became effectively under house arrest as the "personal guest" of the dictator (Seventh Letter 329c-330b).

Plato eventually managed to gain the tyrant's permission to return to Athens (Seventh Letter 338a), and he and Dion were reunited at the Academy (Plut. Dion 17). Dionysius agreed that "after the war" (Seventh Letter 338a; perhaps the Lucanian War in 365 B.C.E.), he would invite Plato and Dion back to Syracuse (Third Letter 316e-317a, Seventh Letter 338a-b). Dion and Plato stayed in Athens for the next four years (c. 365-361 B.C.E.). Dionysius then summoned Plato, but wished for Dion to wait a while longer. Dion accepted the condition and encouraged Plato to go immediately anyway (Third Letter 317a-b, Seventh Letter 338b-c), but Plato refused the invitation, much to the consternation of both Syracusans (Third Letter 317a, Seventh Letter 338c). Hardly a year had passed, however, before Dionysius sent a ship, with one of Plato's Pythagorean friends (Archedemus, an associate of Archytas—see Seventh Letter 339a-b and next section) on board begging Plato to return to Syracuse. Partly because of his friend Dion's enthusiasm for the plan, Plato departed one more time to Syracuse. Once again, however, things in Syracuse were not at all to Plato's liking. Dionysius once again effectively imprisoned Plato in Syracuse, and the latter was only able to escape again with help from his Tarentine friends ( Seventh Letter 350a-b).

Dion subsequently gathered an army of mercenaries and invaded his own homeland. But his success was short-lived: he was assassinated and Sicily was reduced to chaos. Plato, perhaps now completely disgusted with politics, returned to his beloved Academy, where he lived out the last thirteen years of his life. According to Diogenes, Plato was buried at the school he founded (D.L. 3.41). His grave, however, has not yet been discovered by archeological investigations.

2. Influences on Plato

a. Heraclitus

Aristotle and Diogenes agree that Plato had some early association with either the philosophy of Heraclitus of Ephesus, or with one or more of that philosopher's followers (see Aristotle Metaph. 987a32, D.L. 3.4-3.5). The effects of this influence can perhaps be seen in the mature Plato's conception of the sensible world as ceaselessly changing.

b. Parmenides and Zeno

There can be no doubt that Plato was also strongly influenced by Parmenides and Zeno (both of Elea), in Plato's theory of the Forms, which are plainly intended to satisfy the Parmenidean requirement of metaphysical unity and stability in knowable reality. Parmenides and Zeno also appear as characters in his dialogue, the Parmenides. Diogenes Laertius also notes other important influences:

He mixed together in his works the arguments of Heracleitus, the Pythagoreans, and Socrates. Regarding the sensibles, he borrows from Heraclitus; regarding the intelligibles, from Pythagoras; and regarding politics, from Socrates. (D.L. 3.8)

A little later, Diogenes makes a series of comparisons intended to show how much Plato owed to the comic poet, Epicharmus (3.9-3.17).

c. The Pythagoreans

Diogenes Laertius (3.6) claims that Plato visited several Pythagoreans in Southern Italy (one of whom, Theodorus, is also mentioned as a friend to Socrates in Plato's Theaetetus). In the Seventh Letter, we learn that Plato was a friend of Archytas of Tarentum, a well-known Pythagorean statesman and thinker (see 339d-e), and in the Phaedo, Plato has Echecrates, another Pythagorean, in the group around Socrates on his final day in prison. Plato's Pythagorean influences seem especially evident in his fascination with mathematics, and in some of his political ideals (see Plato's political philosophy), expressed in various ways in several dialogues.

d. Socrates

Nonetheless, it is plain that no influence on Plato was greater than that of Socrates. This is evident not only in many of the doctrines and arguments we find in Plato's dialogues, but perhaps most obviously in Plato's choice of Socrates as the main character in most of his works. According to the Seventh Letter, Plato counted Socrates "the justest man alive" (324e). According to Diogenes Laertius, the respect was mutual (3.5).

3. Plato's Writings

a. Plato's Dialogues and the Historical Socrates

Supposedly possessed of outstanding intellectual and artistic ability even from his youth, according to Diogenes, Plato began his career as a writer of tragedies, but hearing Socrates talk, he wholly abandoned that path, and even burned a tragedy he had hoped to enter in a dramatic competition (D.L. 3.5). Whether or not any of these stories is true, there can be no question of Plato's mastery of dialogue, characterization, and dramatic context. He may, indeed, have written some epigrams; of the surviving epigrams attributed to him in antiquity, some may be genuine.

Plato was not the only writer of dialogues in which Socrates appears as a principal character and speaker. Others, including Alexamenos of Teos (Aristotle Poetics 1447b11; De Poetis fr. 3 Ross [=Rose2 72]), Aeschines (D.L. 2.60-63, 3.36, Plato Apology 33e), Antisthenes (D.L. 3.35, 6; Plato, Phaedo 59b; Xenophon, Memorabilia 2.4.5, 3.2.17), Aristippus (D.L. 2.65-104, 3.36, Plato Phaedo 59c), Eucleides (D.L. 2.106-112), Phaedo (D.L. 2.105; Plato, Phaedo passim), Simon (D.L. 122-124), and especially Xenophon (see D.L. 2.48-59, 3.34), were also well-known "Socratics" who composed such works. A recent study of these, by Charles H. Kahn (1996, 1-35), concludes that the very existence of the genre—and all of the conflicting images of Socrates we find given by the various authors—shows that we cannot trust as historically reliable any of the accounts of Socrates given in antiquity, including those given by Plato.

But it is one thing to claim that Plato was not the only one to write Socratic dialogues, and quite another to hold that Plato was only following the rules of some genre of writings in his own work. Such a claim, at any rate, is hardly established simply by the existence of these other writers and their writings. We may still wish to ask whether Plato's own use of Socrates as his main character has anything at all to do with the historical Socrates. The question has led to a number of seemingly irresolvable scholarly disputes. At least one important ancient source, Aristotle, suggests that at least some of the doctrines Plato puts into the mouth of the "Socrates" of the "early" or "Socrates" dialogues are the very ones espoused by the historical Socrates. Because Aristotle has no reason not to be truthful about this issue, many scholars believe that his testimony provides a solid basis for distinguishing the "Socrates" of the "early" dialogues from the character by that name in Plato's supposedly later works, whose views and arguments Aristotle suggests are Plato's own.

b. Dating Plato's Dialogues

One way to approach this issue has been to find some way to arrange the dialogues into at least relative dates. It has frequently been assumed that if we can establish a relative chronology for when Plato wrote each of the dialogues, we can provide some objective test for the claim that Plato represented Socrates more accurately in the earlier dialogues, and less accurately in the later dialogues.

In antiquity, the ordering of Plato's dialogues was given entirely along thematic lines. The best reports of these orderings (see Diogenes Laertius' discussion at 3.56-62) included many works whose authenticity is now either disputed or unanimously rejected. The uncontroversial internal and external historical evidence for a chronological ordering is relatively slight. Aristotle (Politics 2.6.1264b24-27), Diogenes Laertius (3.37), and Olympiodorus (Prol. 6.24) state that Plato wrote the Laws after the Republic. Internal references in the Sophist (217a) and the Statesman (also known as the Politicus; 257a, 258b) show the Statesman to come after the Sophist. The Timaeus (17b-19b) may refer to Republic as coming before it, and more clearly mentions the Critias as following it (27a). Similarly, internal references in the Sophist (216a, 217c) and the Theaetetus (183e) may be thought to show the intended order of three dialogues: Parmenides, Theaetetus, and Sophist. Even so, it does not follow that these dialogues were actually written in that order. At Theaetetus 143c, Plato announces through his characters that he will abandon the somewhat cumbersome dialogue form that is employed in his other writings. Since the form does not appear in a number of other writings, it is reasonable to infer that those in which it does not appear were written after the Theaetetus.

Scholars have sought to augment this fairly scant evidence by employing different methods of ordering the remaining dialogues. One such method is that of stylometry, by which various aspects of Plato's diction in each dialogue are measured against their uses and frequencies in other dialogues. Originally done by laborious study by individuals, stylometry can now be done more efficiently with assistance by computers. Another, even more popular, way to sort and group the dialogues is what is called "content analysis," which works by finding and enumerating apparent commonalities or differences in the philosophical style and content of the various dialogues. Neither of these general approaches has commanded unanimous assent among scholars, and it is unlikely that debates about this topic can ever be put entirely to rest. Nonetheless, most recent scholarship seems to assume that Plato's dialogues can be sorted into different groups, and it is not unusual for books and articles on the philosophy of Socrates to state that by "Socrates" they mean to refer to the character in Plato's "early" or Socratic dialogues, as if this Socrates was as close to the historical Socrates as we are likely to get. (We have more to say on this subject in the next section.) Perhaps the most thorough examination of this sort can be found in Gregory Vlastos's, Socrates: Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge and Cornell, 1991, chapters 2-4), where ten significant differences between the "Socrates" of Plato's "early" dialogues and the character by that name in the later dialogues are noted. Our own view of the probable dates and groups of dialogues, which to some extent combine the results of stylometry and content analysis, is as follows (all lists but the last in alphabetical order):

(All after the death of Socrates, but before Plato's first trip to Sicily in 387 B.C.E.):

Apology, Charmides, Crito, Euthydemus, Euthyphro, Gorgias, Hippias Major, Hippias Minor, Ion, Laches, Lysis, Protagoras, Republic Bk. I.

(Either at the end of the early group or at the beginning of the middle group, c. 387-380 B.C.E.):

Cratylus, Menexenus, Meno

(c. 380-360 B.C.E.)

Phaedo, Republic Bks. II-X, Symposium

(Either at the end of the middle group, or the beginning of the late group, c. 360-355 B.C.E.)

Parmenides, Theaetetus, Phaedrus

(c. 355-347 B.C.E.; possibly in chronological order)

Sophist, Statesman, Philebus, Timaeus, Critias, Laws

c. Transmission of Plato's Works

Except for the Timaeus, all of Plato's works were lost to the Western world until medieval times, preserved only by Moslem scholars in the Middle East. In 1578 Henri Estienne (whose Latinized name was Stephanus) published an edition of the dialogues in which each page of the text is separated into five sections (labeled a, b, c, d, and e). The standard style of citation for Platonic texts includes the name of the text, followed by Stephanus page and section numbers (e.g. Republic 511d). Scholars sometimes also add numbers after the Stephanus section letters, which refer to line numbers within the Stephanus sections in the standard Greek edition of the dialogues, the Oxford Classical texts.

4. Other Works Attributed to Plato

a. Spuria

Several other works, including thirteen letters and eighteen epigrams, have been attributed to Plato. These other works are generally called the spuria and the dubia. The spuria were collected among the works of Plato but suspected as frauds even in antiquity. The dubia are those presumed authentic in later antiquity, but which have more recently been doubted.

Ten of the spuria are mentioned by Diogenes Laertius at 3.62. Five of these are no longer extant: the Midon or Horse-breeder, Phaeacians, Chelidon, Seventh Day, and Epimenides. Five others do exist: the Halcyon, Axiochus, Demodocus, Eryxias, and Sisyphus. To the ten Diogenes Laertius lists, we may uncontroversially add On Justice, On Virtue, and the Definitions, which was included in the medieval manuscripts of Plato's work, but not mentioned in antiquity.

Works whose authenticity was also doubted in antiquity include the Second Alcibiades (or Alcibiades II), Epinomis, Hipparchus, and Rival Lovers (also known as either Rivals or Lovers), and these are sometimes defended as authentic today. If any are of these are authentic, the Epinomis would be in the late group, and the others would go with the early or early transitional groups.

b. Epigrams

Seventeen or eighteen epigrams (poems appropriate to funerary monuments or other dedications) are also attributed to Plato by various ancient authors. Most of these are almost certainly not by Plato, but some few may be authentic. Of the ones that could be authentic (Cooper 1997, 1742 names 1, 2, 7, and especially 3 as possibly authentic), one (1) is a love poem dedicated to a student of astronomy, perhaps at the Academy, another (2) appears to be a funerary inscription for that same student, another (3) is a funerary inscription for Plato's Syracusan friend, Dion (in which the author confesses that Dion "maddened my heart with erôs"), and the last (7) is a love poem to a young woman or girl. None appear to provide anything of great philosophical interest.

c. Dubia

The dubia present special risks to scholars: On the one hand, any decision not to include them among the authentic dialogues creates the risk of losing valuable evidence for Plato's (or perhaps Socrates') philosophy; on the other hand, any decision to include them creates the risk of obfuscating the correct view of Plato's (or Socrates') philosophy, by including non-Platonic (or non-Socratic) elements within that philosophy. The dubia include the First Alcibiades (or Alcibiades I), Minos, and Theages, all of which, if authentic, would probably go with the early or early transitional groups, the Cleitophon, which might be early, early transitional, or middle, and the letters, of which the Seventh seems the best candidate for authenticity. Some scholars have also suggested the possibility that the Third may also be genuine. If any are authentic, the letters would appear to be works of the late period, with the possible exception of the Thirteenth Letter, which could be from the middle period.

Nearly all of the dialogues now accepted as genuine have been challenged as inauthentic by some scholar or another. In the 19th Century in particular, scholars often considered arguments for and against the authenticity of dialogues whose authenticity is now only rarely doubted. Of those we listed as authentic, above (in the early group), only the Hippias Major continues occasionally to be listed as inauthentic. The strongest evidence against the authenticity of the Hippias Major is the fact that it is never mentioned in any of the ancient sources. However, relative to how much was actually written in antiquity, so little now remains that our lack of ancient references to this dialogue does not seem to be an adequate reason to doubt its authenticity. In style and content, it seems to most contemporary scholars to fit well with the other Platonic dialogues.

5. The Early Dialogues

a. Historical Accuracy

Although no one thinks that Plato simply recorded the actual words or speeches of Socrates verbatim, the argument has been made that there is nothing in the speeches Socrates makes in the Apology that he could have not uttered at the historical trial. At any rate, it is fairly common for scholars to treat Plato's Apology as the most reliable of the ancient sources on the historical Socrates. The other early dialogues are certainly Plato's own creations. But as we have said, most scholars treat these as representing more or less accurately the philosophy and behavior of the historical Socrates—even if they do not provide literal historical records of actual Socratic conversations. Some of the early dialogues include anachronisms that prove their historical inaccuracy.

It is possible, of course, that the dialogues are all wholly Plato's inventions and have nothing at all to do with the historical Socrates. Contemporary scholars generally endorse one of the following four views about the dialogues and their representation of Socrates:

  1. The Unitarian View:
    This view, more popular early in the 20th Century than it is now, holds that there is but a single philosophy to be found in all of Plato's works (of any period, if such periods can even be identified reliably). There is no reason, according to the Unitarian scholar, ever to talk about "Socratic philosophy" (at least from anything to be found in Plato—everything in Plato's dialogues is Platonic philosophy, according to the Unitarian). One recent version of this view has been argued by Charles H. Kahn (1996). Most later, but still ancient, interpretations of Plato were essentially Unitarian in their approach. Aristotle, however, was a notable exception.
  2. The Literary Atomist View:
    We call this approach the "literary atomist view," because those who propose this view treat each dialogue as a complete literary whole, whose proper interpretation must be achieved without reference to any of Plato's other works. Those who endorse this view reject completely any relevance or validity of sorting or grouping the dialogues into groups, on the ground that any such sorting is of no value to the proper interpretation of any given dialogue. In this view, too, there is no reason to make any distinction between "Socratic philosophy" and "Platonic philosophy." According to the literary atomist, all philosophy to be found in the works of Plato should be attributed only to Plato.
  3. The Developmentalist View:
    According to this view, the most widely held of all of the interpretative approaches, the differences between the early and later dialogues represent developments in Plato's own philosophical and literary career. These may or may not be related to his attempting in any of the dialogues to preserve the memory of the historical Socrates (see approach 4); such differences may only represent changes in Plato's own philosophical views. Developmentalists may generally identify the earlier positions or works as "Socratic" and the later ones "Platonic," but may be agnostic about the relationship of the "Socratic" views and works to the actual historical Socrates.
  4. The Historicist View:
    Perhaps the most common of the Developmentalist positions is the view that the "development" noticeable between the early and later dialogues may be attributed to Plato's attempt, in the early dialogues, to represent the historical Socrates more or less accurately. Later on, however (perhaps because of the development of the genre of "Socratic writings," within which other authors were making no attempt at historical fidelity), Plato began more freely to put his own views into the mouth of the character, "Socrates," in his works. Plato's own student, Aristotle, seems to have understood the dialogues in this way.

Now, some scholars who are skeptical about the entire program of dating the dialogues into chronological groups, and who are thus strictly speaking not historicists (see, for example, Cooper 1997, xii-xvii) nonetheless accept the view that the "early" works are "Socratic" in tone and content. With few exceptions, however, scholars agreed that if we are unable to distinguish any group of dialogues as early or "Socratic," or even if we can distinguish a separate set of "Socratic" works but cannot identify a coherent philosophy within those works, it makes little sense to talk about "the philosophy of historical Socrates" at all. There is just too little (and too little that is at all interesting) to be found that could reliably be attributed to Socrates from any other ancient authors. Any serious philosophical interest in Socrates, then, must be pursued through study of Plato's early or "Socratic" dialogues.

b. Plato's Characterization of Socrates

In the dialogues generally accepted as early (or "Socratic"), the main character is always Socrates. Socrates is represented as extremely agile in question-and-answer, which has come to be known as "the Socratic method of teaching," or "the elenchus" (or elenchos, from the Greek term for refutation), with Socrates nearly always playing the role as questioner, for he claimed to have no wisdom of his own to share with others. Plato's Socrates, in this period, was adept at reducing even the most difficult and recalcitrant interlocutors to confusion and self-contradiction. In the Apology, Socrates explains that the embarrassment he has thus caused to so many of his contemporaries is the result of a Delphic oracle given to Socrates' friend Chaerephon (Apology 21a-23b), according to which no one was wiser than Socrates. As a result of his attempt to discern the true meaning of this oracle, Socrates gained a divinely ordained mission in Athens to expose the false conceit of wisdom. The embarrassment his "investigations" have caused to so many of his contemporaries—which Socrates claims was the root cause of his being brought up on charges (Apology 23c-24b)—is thus no one's fault but his "victims," for having chosen to live "the unexamined life" (see 38a).

The way that Plato's represents Socrates going about his "mission" in Athens provides a plausible explanation both of why the Athenians would have brought him to trial and convicted him in the troubled years after the end of the Peloponnesian War, and also of why Socrates was not really guilty of the charges he faced. Even more importantly, however, Plato's early dialogues provide intriguing arguments and refutations of proposed philosophical positions that interest and challenge philosophical readers. Platonic dialogues continue to be included among the required readings in introductory and advanced philosophy classes, not only for their ready accessibility, but also because they raise many of the most basic problems of philosophy. Unlike most other philosophical works, moreover, Plato frames the discussions he represents in dramatic settings that make the content of these discussions especially compelling. So, for example, in the Crito, we find Socrates discussing the citizen's duty to obey the laws of the state as he awaits his own legally mandated execution in jail, condemned by what he and Crito both agree was a terribly wrong verdict, the result of the most egregious misapplication of the very laws they are discussing. The dramatic features of Plato's works have earned attention even from literary scholars relatively uninterested in philosophy as such. Whatever their value for specifically historical research, therefore, Plato's dialogues will continue to be read and debated by students and scholars, and the Socrates we find in the early or "Socratic" dialogues will continue to be counted among the greatest Western philosophers.

c. Ethical Positions in the Early Dialogues

The philosophical positions most scholars agree can be found directly endorsed or at least suggested in the early or "Socratic" dialogues include the following moral or ethical views:

  • A rejection of retaliation, or the return of harm for harm or evil for evil (Crito 48b-c, 49c-d; Republic I.335a-e);
  • The claim that doing injustice harms one's soul, the thing that is most precious to one, and, hence, that it is better to suffer injustice than to do it (Crito 47d-48a; Gorgias 478c-e, 511c-512b; Republic I.353d-354a);
  • Some form of what is called "eudaimonism," that is, that goodness is to be understood in terms of conduciveness to human happiness, well-being, or flourishing, which may also be understood as "living well," or "doing well" (Crito 48b; Euthydemus 278e, 282a; Republic I. 354a);
  • The view that only virtue is good just by itself; anything else that is good is good only insofar as it serves or is used for or by virtue (Apology 30b; Euthydemus 281d-e);
  • The view that there is some kind of unity among the virtues: In some sense, all of the virtues are the same (Protagoras 329b-333b, 361a-b);
  • The view that the citizen who has agreed to live in a state must always obey the laws of that state, or else persuade the state to change its laws, or leave the state (Crito 51b-c, 52a-d).

d. Psychological Positions in the Early Dialogues

Socrates also appears to argue for, or directly makes a number of related psychological views:

  • All wrongdoing is done in ignorance, for everyone desires only what is good (Protagoras 352a-c; Gorgias 468b; Meno 77e-78b);
  • In some sense, everyone actually believes certain moral principles, even though some may think they do not have such beliefs, and may disavow them in argument (Gorgias 472b, 475e-476a).

e. Religious Positions in the Early Dialogues

In these dialogues, we also find Socrates represented as holding certain religious beliefs, such as:

  • The gods are completely wise and good (Apology 28a; Euthyphro 6a, 15a; Meno 99b-100b);
  • Ever since his childhood (see Apology 31d) Socrates has experienced a certain "divine something" (Apology 31c-d; 40a; Euthyphro 3b; see also Phaedrus 242b), which consists in a "voice" (Apology 31d; see also Phaedrus 242c), or "sign" (Apology 40c, 41d; Euthydemus 272e; see also Republic VI.496c; Phaedrus 242b) that opposes him when he is about to do something wrong (Apology 40a, 40c);
  • Various forms of divination can allow human beings to come to recognize the will of the gods (Apology 21a-23b, 33c);
  • Poets and rhapsodes are able to write and do the wonderful things they write and do, not from knowledge or expertise, but from some kind of divine inspiration. The same canbe said of diviners and seers, although they do seem to have some kind of expertise—perhaps only some technique by which to put them in a state of appropriate receptivity to the divine (Apology 22b-c; Laches 198e-199a; Ion 533d-536a, 538d-e; Meno 99c);
  • No one really knows what happens after death, but it is reasonable to think that death is not an evil; there may be an afterlife, in which the souls of the good are rewarded, and the souls of the wicked are punished (Apology 40c-41c; Crito 54b-c; Gorgias 523a-527a).

f. Methodological and Epistemological Positions in the Early Dialogues

In addition, Plato's Socrates in the early dialogues may plausibly be regarded as having certain methodological or epistemological convictions, including:

  • Definitional knowledge of ethical terms is at least a necessary condition of reliable judging of specific instances of the values they name (Euthyphro 4e-5d, 6e; Laches 189e-190b; Lysis 223b; Greater Hippias 304d-e; Meno 71a-b, 100b; Republic I.354b-c);
  • A mere list of examples of some ethical value—even if all are authentic cases of that value—would never provide an adequate analysis of what the value is, nor would it provide an adequate definition of the value term that refers to the value. Proper definitions must state what is common to all examples of the value (Euthyphro 6d-e; Meno 72c-d);
  • Those with expert knowledge or wisdom on a given subject do not err in their judgments on that subject (Euthyphro 4e-5a; Euthydemus 279d-280b), go about their business in their area of expertise in a rational and regular way (Gorgias 503e-504b), and can teach and explain their subject (Gorgias 465a, 500e-501b, 514a-b; Laches 185b, 185e, 1889e-190b); Protagoras 319b-c).

6. The Middle Dialogues

a. Differences between the Early and Middle Dialogues

Scholarly attempts to provide relative chronological orderings of the early transitional and middle dialogues are problematical because all agree that the main dialogue of the middle period, the Republic, has several features that make dating it precisely especially difficult. As we have already said, many scholars count the first book of the Republic as among the early group of dialogues. But those who read the entire Republic will also see that the first book also provides a natural and effective introduction to the remaining books of the work. A recent study by Debra Nails ("The Dramatic Date of Plato's Republic," The Classical Journal 93.4, 1998, 383-396) notes several anachronisms that suggest that the process of writing (and perhaps re-editing) the work may have continued over a very long period. If this central work of the period is difficult to place into a specific context, there can be no great assurance in positioning any other works relative to this one.

Nonetheless, it does not take especially careful study of the transitional and middle period dialogues to notice clear differences in style and philosophical content from the early dialogues. The most obvious change is the way in which Plato seems to characterize Socrates: In the early dialogues, we find Socrates simply asking questions, exposing his interlocutors' confusions, all the while professing his own inability to shed any positive light on the subject, whereas in the middle period dialogues, Socrates suddenly emerges as a kind of positive expert, willing to affirm and defend his own theories about many important subjects. In the early dialogues, moreover, Socrates discusses mainly ethical subjects with his interlocutors—with some related religious, methodological, and epistemological views scattered within the primarily ethical discussions. In the middle period, Plato's Socrates' interests expand outward into nearly every area of inquiry known to humankind. The philosophical positions Socrates advances in these dialogues are vastly more systematical, including broad theoretical inquiries into the connections between language and reality (in the Cratylus), knowledge and explanation (in the Phaedo and Republic, Books V-VII). Unlike the Socrates of the early period, who was the "wisest of men" only because he recognized the full extent of his own ignorance, the Socrates of the middle period acknowledges the possibility of infallible human knowledge (especially in the famous similes of light, the simile of the sun and good and the simile of the divided line in Book VI and the parable of the cave in Book VII of the Republic), and this becomes possible in virtue of a special sort of cognitive contact with the Forms or Ideas (eidê ), which exist in a supra-sensible realm available only to thought. This theory of Forms, introduced and explained in various contexts in each of the middle period dialogues, is perhaps the single best-known and most definitive aspect of what has come to be known as Platonism.

b. The Theory of Forms

In many of his dialogues, Plato mentions supra-sensible entities he calls "Forms" (or "Ideas"). So, for example, in the Phaedo, we are told that particular sensible equal things—for example, equal sticks or stones (see Phaedo 74a-75d)—are equal because of their "participation" or "sharing" in the character of the Form of Equality, which is absolutely, changelessly, perfectly, and essentially equal. Plato sometimes characterizes this participation in the Form as a kind of imaging, or approximation of the Form. The same may be said of the many things that are greater or smaller and the Forms of Great and Small (Phaedo 75c-d), or the many tall things and the Form of Tall (Phaedo 100e), or the many beautiful things and the Form of Beauty (Phaedo 75c-d, Symposium 211e, Republic V.476c). When Plato writes about instances of Forms "approximating" Forms, it is easy to infer that, for Plato, Forms are exemplars. If so, Plato believes that The Form of Beauty is perfect beauty, the Form of Justice is perfect justice, and so forth. Conceiving of Forms in this way was important to Plato because it enabled the philosopher who grasps the entities to be best able to judge to what extent sensible instances of the Forms are good examples of the Forms they approximate.

Scholars disagree about the scope of what is often called "the theory of Forms," and question whether Plato began holding that there are only Forms for a small range of properties, such as tallness, equality, justice, beauty, and so on, and then widened the scope to include Forms corresponding to every term that can be applied to a multiplicity of instances. In the Republic, he writes as if there may be a great multiplicity of Forms—for example, in Book X of that work, we find him writing about the Form of Bed (see Republic X.596b). He may have come to believe that for any set of things that shares some property, there is a Form that gives unity to the set of things (and univocity to the term by which we refer to members of that set of things). Knowledge involves the recognition of the Forms (Republic V.475e-480a), and any reliable application of this knowledge will involve the ability compare the particular sensible instantiations of a property to the Form.

c. Immortality and Reincarnation

In the early transitional dialogue, the Meno, Plato has Socrates introduce the Orphic and Pythagorean idea that souls are immortal and existed before our births. All knowledge, he explains, is actually recollected from this prior existence. In perhaps the most famous passage in this dialogue, Socrates elicits recollection about geometry from one of Meno's slaves (Meno 81a-86b). Socrates' apparent interest in, and fairly sophisticated knowledge of, mathematics appears wholly new in this dialogue. It is an interest, however, that shows up plainly in the middle period dialogues, especially in the middle books of the Republic.

Several arguments for the immortality of the soul, and the idea that souls are reincarnated into different life forms, are also featured in Plato's Phaedo (which also includes the famous scene in which Socrates drinks the hemlock and utters his last words). Stylometry has tended to count the Phaedo among the early dialogues, whereas analysis of philosophical content has tended to place it at the beginning of the middle period. Similar accounts of the transmigration of souls may be found, with somewhat different details, in Book X of the Republic and in the Phaedrus, as well as in several dialogues of the late period, including the Timaeus and the Laws. No traces of the doctrine of recollection, or the theory of reincarnation or transmigration of souls, are to be found in the dialogues we listed above as those of the early period.

d. Moral Psychology

The moral psychology of the middle period dialogues also seems to be quite different from what we find in the early period. In the early dialogues, Plato's Socrates is an intellectualist—that is, he claims that people always act in the way they believe is best for them (at the time of action, at any rate). Hence, all wrongdoing reflects some cognitive error. But in the middle period, Plato conceives of the soul as having (at least) three parts:

  1. a rational part (the part that loves truth, which should rule over the other parts of the soul through the use of reason),
  2. a spirited part (which loves honor and victory), and
  3. an appetitive part (which desires food, drink, and sex),

and justice will be that condition of the soul in which each of these three parts "does its own work," and does not interfere in the workings of the other parts (see esp. Republic IV.435b-445b). It seems clear from the way Plato describes what can go wrong in a soul, however, that in this new picture of moral psychology, the appetitive part of the soul can simply overrule reason's judgments. One may suffer, in this account of psychology, from what is called akrasia or "moral weakness"—in which one finds oneself doing something that one actually believes is not the right thing to do (see especially Republic IV.439e-440b). In the early period, Socrates denied that akrasia was possible: One might change one's mind at the last minute about what one ought to do—and could perhaps change one's mind again later to regret doing what one has done—but one could never do what one actually believed was wrong, at the time of acting.

e. Critique of the Arts

The Republic also introduces Plato's notorious critique of the visual and imitative arts. In the early period works, Socrates contends that the poets lack wisdom, but he also grants that they "say many fine things." In the Republic, on the contrary, it seems that there is little that is fine in poetry or any of the other fine arts. Most of poetry and the other fine arts are to be censored out of existence in the "noble state" (kallipolis) Plato sketches in the Republic, as merely imitating appearances (rather than realities), and as arousing excessive and unnatural emotions and appetites (see esp. Republic X.595b-608b).

f. Platonic Love

In the Symposium, which is normally dated at the beginning of the middle period, and in the Phaedrus, which is dated at the end of the middle period or later yet, Plato introduces his theory of erôs (usually translated as "love"). Several passages and images from these dialogues continued to show up in Western culture—for example, the image of two lovers as being each other's "other half," which Plato assigns to Aristophanes in the Symposium. Also in that dialogue, we are told of the "ladder of love," by which the lover can ascend to direct cognitive contact with (usually compared to a kind of vision of) Beauty Itself. In the Phaedrus, love is revealed to be the great "divine madness" through which the wings of the lover's soul may sprout, allowing the lover to take flight to all of the highest aspirations and achievements possible for humankind. In both of these dialogues, Plato clearly regards actual physical or sexual contact between lovers as degraded and wasteful forms of erotic expression. Because the true goal of erôs is real beauty and real beauty is the Form of Beauty, what Plato calls Beauty Itself, erôs finds its fulfillment only in Platonic philosophy. Unless it channels its power of love into "higher pursuits," which culminate in the knowledge of the Form of Beauty, erôs is doomed to frustration. For this reason, Plato thinks that most people sadly squander the real power of love by limiting themselves to the mere pleasures of physical beauty.

7. Late Transitional and Late Dialogues

a. Philosophical Methodology

One of the novelties of the dialogues after those of the middle period is the introduction of a new philosophical method. This method was introduced probably either late in the middle period or in the transition to the late period, but was increasingly important in the late period. In the early period dialogues, as we have said, the mode of philosophizing was refutative question-and-answer (called elenchos or the "Socratic method"). Although the middle period dialogues continue to show Socrates asking questions, the questioning in these dialogues becomes much more overtly leading and didactic. The highest method of philosophizing discussed in the middle period dialogues, called "dialectic," is never very well explained (at best, it is just barely sketched in the divided line image at the end of Book VI of the Republic). The correct method for doing philosophy, we are now told in the later works, is what Plato identifies as "collection and division," which is perhaps first referred to at Phaedrus 265e. In this method, the philosopher collects all of the instances of some generic category that seem to have common characteristics, and then divides them into specific kinds until they cannot be further subdivided. This method is explicitly and extensively on display in the Sophist, Statesman, and Philebus.

b. Critique of the Earlier Theory of Forms

One of the most puzzling features of the late dialogues is the strong suggestion in them that Plato has reconsidered his theory of Forms in some way. Although there seems still in the late dialogues to be a theory of Forms (although the theory is, quite strikingly, wholly unmentioned in the Theaetetus, a later dialogue on the nature of knowledge), where it does appear in the later dialogues, it seems in several ways to have been modified from its conception in the middle period works. Perhaps the most dramatic signal of such a change in the theory appears first in the Parmenides, which appears to subject the middle period version of the theory to a kind of "Socratic" refutation, only this time, the main refuter is the older Eleatic philosopher Parmenides, and the hapless victim of the refutation is a youthful Socrates. The most famous (and apparently fatal) of the arguments provided by Parmenides in this dialogue has come to be known as the "Third Man Argument," which suggests that the conception of participation (by which individual objects take on the characters of the Forms) falls prey to an infinite regress: If individual male things are male in virtue of participation in the Form of Man, and the Form of Man is itself male, then what is common to both The Form of Man and the particular male things must be that they all participate in some (other) Form, say, Man 2. But then, if Man 2 is male, then what it has in common with the other male things is participation in some further Form, Man 3, and so on. That Plato's theory is open to this problem gains support from the notion, mentioned above, that Forms are exemplars. If the Form of Man is itself a (perfect) male, then the Form shares a property in common with the males that participate in it. But since the Theory requires that for any group of entities with a common property, there is a Form to explain the commonality, it appears that the theory does indeed give rise to the vicious regress.

There has been considerable controversy for many years over whether Plato believed that the Theory of Forms was vulnerable to the "Third Man" argument, as Aristotle believed it was, and so uses the Parmenides to announce his rejection of the Theory of Forms, or instead believed that the Third Man argument can be avoided by making adjustments to the Theory of Forms. Of relevance to this discussion is the relative dating of the Timaeus and the Parmenides, since the Theory of Forms very much as it appears in the middle period works plays a prominent role in the Timaeus. Thus, the assignment of a later date to the Timaeus shows that Plato did not regard the objection to the Theory of Forms raised in the Parmenides as in any way decisive. In any event, it is agreed on all sides that Plato's interest in the Theory shifted in the Sophist and Stateman to the exploration of the logical relations that hold between abstract entities. In the Laws, Plato's last (and unfinished) work, the Theory of Forms appears to have dropped out altogether. Whatever value Plato believed that knowledge of abstract entities has for the proper conduct of philosophy, he no longer seems to have believed that such knowledge is necessary for the proper running of a political community.

c. The "Eclipse" of Socrates

In several of the late dialogues, Socrates is even further marginalized. He is either represented as a mostly mute bystander (in the Sophist and Statesman), or else absent altogether from the cast of characters (in the Laws and Critias). In the Theaetetus and Philebus, however, we find Socrates in the familiar leading role. The so-called "eclipse" of Socrates in several of the later dialogues has been a subject of much scholarly discussion.

d. The Myth of Atlantis

Plato's famous myth of Atlantis is first given in the Timaeus, which scholars now generally agree is quite late, despite being dramatically placed on the day after the discussion recounted in the Republic. The myth of Atlantis is continued in the unfinished dialogue intended to be the sequel to the Timaeus, the Critias.

e. The Creation of the Universe

The Timaeus is also famous for its account of the creation of the universe by the Demiurge. Unlike the creation by the God of medieval theologians, Plato's Demiurge does not create ex nihilo, but rather orders the cosmos out of chaotic elemental matter, imitating the eternal Forms. Plato takes the four elements, fire, air, water, and earth (which Plato proclaims to be composed of various aggregates of triangles), making various compounds of these into what he calls the Body of the Universe. Of all of Plato's works, the Timaeus provides the most detailed conjectures in the areas we now regard as the natural sciences: physics, astronomy, chemistry, and biology.

f. The Laws

In the Laws, Plato's last work, the philosopher returns once again to the question of how a society ought best to be organized. Unlike his earlier treatment in the Republic, however, the Laws appears to concern itself less with what a best possible state might be like, and much more squarely with the project of designing a genuinely practicable, if admittedly not ideal, form of government. The founders of the community sketched in the Laws concern themselves with the empirical details of statecraft, fashioning rules to meet the multitude of contingencies that are apt to arise in the "real world" of human affairs. A work enormous length and complexity, running some 345 Stephanus pages, the Laws was unfinished at the time of Plato's death. According to Diogenes Laertius (3.37), it was left written on wax tablets.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Greek Texts

  • Platonis Opera (in 5 volumes) - The Oxford Classical Texts (Oxford: Oxford University Press):
  • Volume I (E. A. Duke et al., eds., 1995): Euthyphro, Apologia Socratis, Crito, Phaedo, Cratylus, Theaetetus, Sophista, Politicus.
  • Volume II (John Burnet, ed., 1901): Parmenides, Philebus, Symposium, Phaedrus, Alcibiades I, Alcibiades II, Hipparchus, Amatores.
  • Volume III (John Burnet, ed., 1903): Theages, Charmides, Laches, Lysis, Euthydemus, Protagoras, Gorgias, Meno, Hippias Maior, Hippias Minor, Io, Menexenus.
  • Volume IV (John Burnet, ed., 1978): Clitopho, Respublica, Timaeus, Critias.
  • Volume V (John Burnet, ed. 1907): Minos, Leges, Epinomis, Epistulae, Definitiones, De Iusto, De Virtute, Demodocus, Sisyphus, Eryxias, Axiochus.
    • The Oxford Classical Texts are the standard Greek texts of Plato's works, including all of the spuria and dubia except for the epigrams, the Greek texts of which may be found in Hermann Beckby (ed.), Anthologia Graeca (Munich: Heimeran, 1957).

b. Translations into English

  • Cooper, J. M. (ed.), Plato: Complete Works (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997).
    • Contains very recent translations of all of the Platonic works, dubia, spuria, and epigrams. Now generally regarded as the standard for English translations.

c. Plato's Socrates and the Historical Socrates

  • Kahn, Charles H., Plato and the Socratic Dialogue (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
    • Kahn's own version of the "unitarian" reading of Plato's dialogues. Although scholars have not widely accepted Kahn's positions, Kahn offers several arguments for rejecting the more established held "developmentalist" position.
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socrates, Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press and Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1991).
    • Chapters 2 and 3 of this book are invariably cited as providing the most influential recent arguments for the "historicist" version of the "developmentalist" position.

d. Socrates and Plato's Early Period Dialogues

  • Benson, Hugh H. (ed.), Essays on the Philosophy of Socrates (New York: Oxford University Press, 1992).
    • A collection of previously published articles by various authors on Socrates and Plato's early dialogues.
  • Brickhouse, Thomas C. and Nicholas D. Smith, Plato's Socrates (New York: Oxford University Press, 1994).
    • Six chapters, each on different topics in the study of Plato's early or Socratic dialogues.
  • Brickhouse, Thomas C. and Nicholas D. Smith, The Philosophy of Socrates (Boulder: Westview, 2000).
    • Seven chapters, each on different topics in the study of Plato's early or Socratic dialogues. Some changes in views from those offered in their 1994 book.
  • Prior, William (ed.), Socrates: Critical Assessments (London and New York, 1996) in four volumes: I: The Socratic Problem and Socratic Ignorance; II: Issues Arising from the Trial of Socrates; III: Socratic Method; IV: Happiness and Virtue.
    • A collection of previously published articles by various authors on Socrates and Plato's early dialogues.
  • Santas, Gerasimos Xenophon, Socrates: Philosophy in Plato's Early Dialogues (Boston and London: Routledge, 1979).
    • Eight chapters, each on different topics in the study of Plato's early or Socratic dialogues.
  • Taylor, C. C. W. Socrates: A Very Short Introduction (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
    • Very short, indeed, but nicely written and generally very reliable.
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socrates, Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press and Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1991). (Also cited in VIII.3, above.)
    • Eight chapters, each on different topics in the study of Plato's early or Socratic dialogues.
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Socratic Studies (ed. Myles Burnyeat; Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
    • Edited and published after Vlastos's death. A collection of Vlastos's papers on Socrates not published in Vlastos's 1991 book.
  • Vlastos, Gregory (ed.) The Philosophy of Socrates (South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1980).
    • A collection of papers by various authors on Socrates and Plato's early dialogues. Although now somewhat dated, several articles in this collection continue to be widely cited and studied.

e. General Books on Plato

  • Cherniss, Harold, The Riddle of the Early Academy (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1945).
    • A study of reports in the Early Academy, following Plato's death, of the so-called "unwritten doctrines" of Plato.
  • Fine, Gail (ed.), Plato I: Metaphysics and Epistemology and Plato II: Ethics, Politics, Religion and the Soul (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
    • A collection of previously published papers by various authors, mostly on Plato's middle and later periods.
  • Grote, George, Plato and the Other Companions of Sokrates 2nd ed. 3 vols. (London: J. Murray, 1867).
    • 3-volume collection with general discussion of "the Socratics" other than Plato, as well as specific discussions of each of Plato's works.
  • Guthrie, W. K. C., A History of Greek Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press) vols. 3 (1969), 4 (1975) and 5 (1978).
    • Volume 3 is on the Sophists and Socrates; volume 4 is on Plato's early dialogues and continues with chapters on Phaedo, Symposium, and Phaedrus, and then a final chapter on the Republic.
  • Irwin, Terence, Plato's Ethics (New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995).
    • Systematic discussion of the ethical thought in Plato's works.
  • Kraut, Richard (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Plato (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992).
    • A collection of original discussions of various general topics about Plato and the dialogues.
  • Smith, Nicholas D. (ed.), Plato: Critical Assessments (London and New York: Routledge, 1998) in four volumes: I: General Issues of Interpretation; II: Plato's Middle Period: Metaphysics and Epistemology; III: Plato's Middle Period: Psychology and Value Theory; IV: Plato's Later Works.
    • A collection of previously published articles by various authors on interpretive problems and on Plato's middle and later periods. Plato's early period dialogues are covered in this series by Prior 1996 (see VIII.4).
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Platonic Studies 2nd ed. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1981).
    • A collection of Vlastos's papers on Plato, including some important earlier work on the early dialogues.
  • Vlastos, Gregory, Plato I: Metaphysics and Epistemology and Plato II: Ethics, Politics, and Philosophy of Art and Religion (South Bend: University of Notre Dame Press, 1987).
    • A collection of papers by various authors on Plato's middle period and later dialogues. Although now somewhat dated, several articles in this collection continue to be widely cited and studied.

Author Information

Thomas Brickhouse
Lynchburg College
U. S. A.


Nicholas D. Smith
Lewis & Clark College
U. S. A.

Anaximenes (d. 528 B.C.E.)

AnaximenesAccording to the surviving sources on his life, Anaximenes flourished in the mid 6th century B.C.E. and died about 528. He is the third philosopher of the Milesian School of philosophy, so named because like Thales and Anaximander, Anaximenes was an inhabitant of Miletus, in Ionia (ancient Greece). Theophrastus notes that Anaximenes was an associate, and possibly a student, of Anaximander's.

Anaximenes is best known for his doctrine that air is the source of all things. In this way, he differed with his predecessors like Thales, who held that water is the source of all things, and Anaximander, who thought that all things came from an unspecified boundless stuff.

Table of Contents

  1. Doctrine of Air
  2. Doctrine of Change
  3. Origin of the Cosmos
  4. Influence on Later Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Doctrine of Air

Anaximenes seems to have held that at one time everything was air. Air can be thought of as a kind of neutral stuff that is found everywhere, and is available to participate in physical processes. Natural forces constantly act on the air and transform it into other materials, which came together to form the organized world. In early Greek literature, air is associated with the soul (the breath of life) and Anaximenes may have thought of air as capable of directing its own development, as the soul controls the body (DK13B2 in the Diels-Kranz collection of Presocratic sources). Accordingly, he ascribed to air divine attributes.

2. Doctrine of Change

Given his doctrine that all things are composed of air, Anaximenes suggested an interesting qualitative account of natural change:

[Air] differs in essence in accordance with its rarity or density. When it is thinned it becomes fire, while when it is condensed it becomes wind, then cloud, when still more condensed it becomes water, then earth, then stones. Everything else comes from these. (DK13A5)

Using two contrary processes of rarefaction and condensation, Anaximenes explains how air is part of a series of changes. Fire turns to air, air to wind, wind to cloud, cloud to water, water to earth and earth to stone. Matter can travel this path by being condensed, or the reverse path from stones to fire by being successively more rarefied. Anaximenes provides a crude kind of empirical support by appealing to a simple experiment: if one blows on one's hand with the mouth relaxed, the air is hot; if one blows with pursed lips, the air is cold (DK13B1). Hence, according to Anaximenes we see that rarity is correlated with heat (as in fire), and density with coldness, (as in the denser stuffs).

Anaximenes was the first recorded thinker who provided a theory of change and supported it with observation. Anaximander had described a sequence of changes that a portion of the boundless underwent to form the different stuffs of the world, but he gave no scientific reason for changes, nor did he describe any mechanism by which they might come about. By contrast, Anaximenes uses a process familiar from everyday experience to account for material change. He also seems to have referred to the process of felting, by which wool is compressed to make felt. This industrial process provides a model of how one stuff can take on new properties when it is compacted.

3. Origin of the Cosmos

Anaximenes, like Anaximander, gives an account of how our world came to be out of previously existing matter. According to Anaximenes, earth was formed from air by a felting process. It began as a flat disk. From evaporations from the earth, fiery bodies arose which came to be the heavenly bodies. The earth floats on a cushion of air. The heavenly bodies, or at least the sun and the moon, seem also to be flat bodies that float on streams of air. On one account, the heavens are like a felt cap that turns around the head. The stars may be fixed to this surface like nails. In another account, the stars are like fiery leaves floating on air (DK13A14). The sun does not travel under the earth but circles around it, and is hidden by the higher parts of the earth at night.

Like Anaximander, Anaximenes uses his principles to account for various natural phenomena. Lightning and thunder result from wind breaking out of clouds; rainbows are the result of the rays of the sun falling on clouds; earthquakes are caused by the cracking of the earth when it dries out after being moistened by rains. He gives an essentially correct account of hail as frozen rainwater.

Most commentators, following Aristotle, understand Anaximenes’ theory of change as presupposing material monism. According to this theory, there is only one substance, (in this case air) from which all existing things are composed. The several stuffs: wind, cloud, water, etc., are only modifications of the real substance that is always and everywhere present. There is no independent evidence to support this interpretation, which seems to require Aristotle’s metaphysical concepts of form and matter, substratum and accident that are too advanced for this period. Anaximenes may have supposed that the ‘stuffs’ simply change into one another in order.

4. Influence on Later Philosophy

Anaximenes’ theory of successive change of matter by rarefaction and condensation was influential in later theories. It is developed by Heraclitus (DK22B31), and criticized by Parmenides (DK28B8.23-24, 47-48). Anaximenes’ general theory of how the materials of the world arise is adopted by Anaxagoras(DK59B16), even though the latter has a very different theory of matter. Both Melissus (DK30B8.3) and Plato (Timaeus 49b-c) see Anaximenes’ theory as providing a common-sense explanation of change. Diogenes of Apollonia makes air the basis of his explicitly monistic theory. The Hippocratic treatise On Breaths uses air as the central concept in a theory of diseases. By providing cosmological accounts with a theory of change, Anaximenes separated them from the realm of mere speculation and made them, at least in conception, scientific theories capable of testing.

5. References and Further Reading

There are no monographs on Anaximenes in English. Articles on him are sometimes rather specialized in nature. A number of chapters in books on the Presocratics are helpful.

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul (1 vol. edn.), 1982. Ch. 3.
    • Gives a philosophically rich defense of the standard interpretation of Anaximenes.
  • Bicknell, P. J. "Anaximenes' Astronomy." Acta Classica 12: 53-85.
    • An interesting reconstruction of the conflicting reports on Anaximenes' astronomy.
  • Classen, C. Joachim. "Anaximander and Anaximenes: The Earliest Greek Theories of Change?" Phronesis 22: 89-102.
    • This article provides a good assessment of one of Anaximenes' major contributions.
  • Guthrie, W. K. C. A History of Greek Philosophy. Vol. 1. Cambridge: Cambridge U. Pr., 1962. 115-40.
    • A good introduction to Anaximenes' thought.
  • Kirk, G. S., J. E. Raven and M. Schofield. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd edn. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1983. Ch. 4.
    • A careful analysis of the texts of Anaximenes.
  • Wöhrle, Georg. Anaximenes aus Milet. Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 1993.
    • This brief edition adds four new testimonies to the evidence about Anaximenes and challenges the standard interpretation. It is useful as a counterbalance to the received view, though I think particular criticisms it makes of that view are wrong.

Author Information

Daniel W. Graham
Brigham Young University
U. S. A.


Table of Contents

  1. General Description
  2. Stoic Logic
  3. Stoic Physics
  4. Stoic Ethics

1. General Description

The term "Stoicism" derives from the Greek word "stoa," referring to a colonnade, such as those built outside or inside temples, around dwelling-houses, gymnasia, and market-places. They were also set up separately as ornaments of the streets and open places. The simplest form is that of a roofed colonnade, with a wall on one side, which was often decorated with paintings. Thus in the market-place at Athens the stoa poikile (Painted Colonnade) was decorated with Polygnotus's representations of the destruction of Troy, the fight of the Athenians with the Amazons, and the battles of Marathon and Oenoe. Zeno of Citium taught in the stoa poikile in Athens, and his adherents accordingly obtained the name of Stoics. Zeno was followed by Cleanthes, and then by Chrysippus, as leaders of the school. The school attracted many adherents, and flourished for centuries, not only in Greece, but later in Rome, where the most thoughtful writers, such as Marcus Aurelius, Seneca, and Epictetus, counted themselves among its followers.

We know little for certain as to what share particular Stoics, Zeno, Cleanthes, or Chrysippus, had in the formation of the doctrines of the school, but after Chryssipus the main lines of the doctrine were complete. The Stoic doctrine is divided into three parts: logic, physics, and ethics. Stoicism is essentially a system of ethics which, however, is guided by a logic as theory of method, and rests upon physics as foundation. Briefly, their notion of morality is stern, involving a life in accordance with nature and controlled by virtue. It is an ascetic system, teaching perfect indifference (apathea) to everything external, for nothing external could be either good or evil. Hence to the Stoics both pain and pleasure, poverty and riches, sickness and health, were supposed to be equally unimportant.

2. Stoic Logic

Stoic logic is, in all essentials, the logic of Aristotle. To this, however, they added a theory, peculiar to themselves, of the origin of knowledge and the criterion of truth. All knowledge, they said, enters the mind through the senses. The mind is a blank slate, upon which sense-impressions are inscribed. It may have a certain activity of its own, but this activity is confined exclusively to materials supplied by the physical organs of sense. This theory stands, of course, in sheer opposition to the idealism of Plato, for whom the mind alone was the source of knowledge, the senses being the sources of all illusion and error. The Stoics denied the metaphysical reality of concepts. Concepts are merely ideas in the mind, abstracted from particulars, and have no reality outside consciousness.

Since all knowledge is a knowledge of sense-objects, truth is simply the correspondence of our impressions to things. How are we to know whether our ideas are correct copies of things? How do we distinguish between reality and imagination, dreams, or illusions? What is the criterion of truth? It cannot lie in concepts, since they are of our own making. Nothing is true save sense impressions, and therefore the criterion of truth must lie in sensation itself. It cannot be in thought, but must be in feeling. Real objects, said the Stoics, produce in us an intense feeling, or conviction, of their reality. The strength and vividness of the image distinguish these real perceptions from a dream or fancy. Hence the sole criterion of truth is this striking conviction, whereby the real forces itself upon our consciousness, and will not be denied. There is, thus, no universally grounded criterion of truth. It is based, not on reason, but on feeling.

3. Stoic Physics

The fundamental proposition of the Stoic physics is that "nothing incorporeal exists." This materialism coheres with the sense-impression orientation of their doctrine of knowledge. Plato placed knowledge in thought, and reality, therefore, in the ideal form. The Stoics, however, place knowledge in physical sensation, and reality -- what is known by the senses -- is matter. All things, they said, even the soul, even God himself, are material and nothing more than material. This belief they based upon two main considerations. Firstly, the unity of the world demands it. The world is one, and must issue from one principle. We must have a monism. The idealism of Plato resolved itself into a futile struggle involving a dualism between matter and thought. Since the gulf cannot be bridged from the side of ideal realm of the forms, we must take our stand on matter, and reduce mind to it. Secondly, body and soul, God and the world, are pairs which act and react upon one another. The body, for example, produces thoughts (sense impressions) in the soul, the soul produces movements in the body. This would be impossible if both were not of the same substance. The corporeal cannot act on the incorporeal, nor the incorporeal on the corporeal. There is no point of contact. Hence all must be equally corporeal.

All things being material, what is the original kind of matter, or stuff, out of which the world is made? The Stoics turned to Heraclitus for an answer. Fire (logos) is the primordial kind of being, and all things are composed of fire. With this materialism the Stoics combined pantheism. The primal fire is God. God is related to the world exactly as the soul to the body. The human soul is likewise fire, and comes from the divine fire. It permeates and penetrates the entire body, and, in order that its interpenetration might be regarded as complete, the Stoics denied the impenetrability of matter. Just as the soul-fire permeates the whole body, so God, the primal fire, pervades the entire world.

But in spite of this materialism, the Stoics declared that God is absolute reason. This is not a return to idealism, and does not imply the incorporeality of God. For reason, like all else, is material. It means simply that the divine fire is a rational element. Since God is reason, it follows that the world is governed by reason, and this means two things. It means, firstly, that there is purpose in the world, and therefore, order, harmony, beauty, and design. Secondly, since reason is law as opposed to the lawless, it means that the universe is subject to the absolute sway of law, is governed by the rigorous necessity of cause and effect. Hence the individual is not free. There can be no true freedom of the will in a world governed by necessity. We may, without harm, say that we choose to do this or that, and that our acts are voluntary. But such phrases merely mean that we assent to what we do. What we do is none the less governed by causes, and therefore by necessity.

The world-process is circular. God changes the fiery substance of himself first into air, then water, then earth. So the world arises. But it will be ended by a conflagration in which all things will return into the primal fire. Thereafter, at a pre-ordained time, God will again transmute himself into a world. It follows from the law of necessity that the course taken by this second, and every subsequent, world, will be identical in every way with the course taken by the first world. The process goes on for ever, and nothing new ever happens. The history of each successive world is the same as that of all the others down to the minutest details.

The human soul is part of the divine fire, and proceeds into humans from God. Hence it is a rational soul, and this is a point of cardinal importance in connection with the Stoic ethics. But the soul of each individual does not come direct from God. The divine fire was breathed into the first man, and thereafter passed from parent to child in the act of procreation. After death, all souls ( according to some scholars) or only the souls of the good (according to other scholars) continue in individual existence until the general conflagration in which they, and all else, return to God.

4. Stoic Ethics

The Stoic ethical teaching is based upon two principles already developed in their physics; first, that the universe is governed by absolute law, which admits of no exceptions; and second, that the essential nature of humans is reason. Both are summed up in the famous Stoic maxim, "Live according to nature." For this maxim has two aspects. It means, in the first place, that men should conform themselves to nature in the wider sense, that is, to the laws of the universe, and secondly, that they should conform their actions to nature in the narrower sense, to their own essential nature, reason. These two expressions mean, for the Stoics, the same thing. For the universe is governed not only by law, but by the law of reason, and we, in following our own rational nature, are ipso facto conforming ourselves to the laws of the larger world. In a sense, of course, there is no possibility of our disobeying the laws of nature, for we, like all else in the world, act of necessity. And it might be asked, what is the use of exhorting a person to obey the laws of the universe, when, as part of the great mechanism of the world, we cannot by any possibility do anything else? It is not to be supposed that a genuine solution of this difficulty is to be found in Stoic philosophy. They urged, however, that, though we will in any case do as the necessity of the world compels us, it is given to us alone, not merely to obey the law, but to assent to our own obedience, to follow the law consciously and deliberately, as only a rational being can.

Virtue, then, is the life according to reason. Morality is simply rational action. It is the universal reason which is to govern our lives, not the caprice and self-will of the individual. The wise man consciously subordinates his life to the life of the whole universe, and recognizes himself as a cog in the great machine. Now the definition of morality as the life according to reason is not a principle peculiar to the Stoics. Both Plato and Aristotle taught the same. In fact, it is the basis of every ethic to found morality upon reason, and not upon the particular foibles, feelings, or intuitions, of the individual self. But what was peculiar to the Stoics was the narrow and one- sided interpretation which they gave to this principle. Aristotle had taught that the essential nature of humans is reason, and that morality consists in following this, his essential nature. But he recognized that the passions and appetites have their place in the human organism. He did not demand their suppression, but merely their control by reason. But the Stoics looked upon the passions as essentially irrational, and demanded their complete extirpation. They envisaged life as a battle against the passions, in which the latter had to be completely annihilated. Hence their ethical views end in a rigorous and unbalanced asceticism.

Aristotle, in his broad and moderate way, though he believed virtue alone to possess intrinsic value, yet allowed to external goods and circumstances a place in the scheme of life. The Stoics asserted that virtue alone is good, vice alone evil, and that all else is absolutely indifferent. Poverty, sickness, pain, and death, are not evils. Riches, health, pleasure, and life, are not goods. A person may commit suicide, for in destroying his life he destroys nothing of value. Above all, pleasure is not a good. One ought not to seek pleasure. Virtue is the only happiness. And people must be virtuous, not for the sake of pleasure, but for the sake of duty. And since virtue alone is good, vice alone evil, there followed the further paradox that all virtues are equally good, and all vices equally evil. There are no degrees.

Virtue is founded upon reason, and so upon knowledge. Hence the importance of science, physics, and logic, which are valued not for themselves, but because they are the foundations of morality. The prime virtue, and the root of all other virtues, is therefore wisdom. The wise man is synonymous with the good man. From the root-virtue, wisdom, spring the four cardinal virtues: insight, bravery, self-control, and justice. But since all virtues have one root, those who possess wisdom possess all virtue, and those who lack it lack all. A person is either wholly virtuous, or wholly vicious. The world is divided into wise and foolish people, the former perfectly good, the latter absolutely evil. There is nothing between the two. There is no such thing as a gradual transition from one to the other. Conversion must be instantaneous. the wise person is perfect, has all happiness, freedom, riches, beauty. They alone are the perfect kings, politicians, poets, prophets, orators, critics, and physicians. The fool has all vice, all misery, all ugliness, all poverty. And every person is one or the other. Asked where such a wise person was to be found, the Stoics pointed doubtfully at Socrates and Diogenes the Cynic. The number of the wise, they thought, is small, and is continually growing smaller. The world, which they painted in the blackest colors as a sea of vice and misery, grows steadily worse.

The similarities between Cynicism and Stoic ethics are apparent. However, the Stoics modified and softened the harsh outlines of Cynicism. To do this meant inconsistency, though. It meant that they first laid down harsh principles, and then proceeded to tone them down, to explain them away, to admit exceptions. Such inconsistency the Stoics accepted with their habitual cheerfulness. This process of toning down their first harsh utterances took place mainly in three ways. First, they modified their principle of the complete suppression of the passions. Since this is impossible, and, if possible, could only lead to immovable inactivity, they admitted that the wise person might exhibit certain mild and rational emotions. Thus, the roots of the passions might be found in the wise person, though they would never be allowed to grow. In the second place, they modified their principle that all else, save virtue and vice, is indifferent. Such a view is unreal, and out of accord with life. Hence the Stoics, with a masterly disregard of consistency, stuck to the principle, and yet declared that among things indifferent some are preferable to others. If the wise person has the choice between health and sickness, health is preferable. Indifferent things were thus divided into three classes: those to be preferred, those to be avoided, and those which are absolutely indifferent.

In the third place, the Stoics toned down the principle that people are either wholly good, or wholly evil. The famous heroes and politicians of history, though fools, are yet polluted with the common vices of humankind less than others. Moreover, what were the Stoics to say about themselves? Were they wise men or fools? They hesitated to claim perfection, to put themselves on a level with Socrates and Diogenes. Yet they could not bring themselves to admit that there was no difference between themselves and the common herd. They were "proficients," and, if not absolutely wise, approximated to wisdom.

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Plotinus (204—270 C.E.)

PlotinusPlotinus is considered to be the founder of Neoplatonism. Taking his lead from his reading of Plato, Plotinus developed a complex spiritual cosmology involving three foundational elements: the One, the Intelligence, and the Soul. It is from the productive unity of these three Beings that all existence emanates, according to Plotinus. The principal of emanation is not simply causal, but also contemplative. In his system, Plotinus raises intellectual contemplation to the status of a productive principle; and it is by virtue of contemplation that all existents are said to be united as a single, all-pervasive reality. In this sense, Plotinus is not a strict pantheist, yet his system does not permit the notion of creatio ex nihilo (creation out of nothingness). In addition to his cosmology, Plotinus also developed a unique theory of sense-perception and knowledge, based on the idea that the mind plays an active role in shaping or ordering the objects of its perception, rather than passively receiving the data of sense experience (in this sense, Plotinus may be said to have anticipated the phenomenological theories of Husserl). Plotinus' doctrine that the soul is composed of a higher and a lower part -- the higher part being unchangeable and divine (and aloof from the lower part, yet providing the lower part with life), while the lower part is the seat of the personality (and hence the passions and vices) -- led him to neglect an ethics of the individual human being in favor of a mystical or soteric doctrine of the soul's ascent to union with its higher part. The philosophy of Plotinus is represented in the complete collection of his treatises, collected and edited by his student Porphyry into six books of nine treatises each. For this reason they have come down to us under the title of the Enneads.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Metaphysics and Cosmology
    1. The One
      1. Emanation and Multiplicity
      2. Presence
    2. The Intelligence
      1. The Ideas and 'Seminal Reasons'
      2. Being and Life
    3. The Soul
      1. Virtue
      2. Dialectic
      3. Contemplation
    4. Matter
      1. Evil
      2. Love and Happiness
      3. A Note on Nature
  3. Psychology and Epistemology
    1. The Living Being
    2. Sense-Perception and Memory
    3. Individuality and Personality
  4. Ethics
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Plotinus was born in 204 C.E. in Egypt, the exact location of which is unknown. In his mid-twenties Plotinus gravitated to Alexandria, where he attended the lectures of various philosophers, not finding satisfaction with any until he discovered the teacher Ammonius Saccas. He remained with Ammonius until 242, at which time he joined up with the Emperor Gordian on an expedition to Persia, for the purpose, it seems, of engaging the famed philosophers of that country in the pursuit of wisdom. The expedition never met its destination, for the Emperor was assassinated in Mesopotamia, and Plotinus returned to Rome to set up a school of philosophy. By this time, Plotinus had reached his fortieth year. He taught in Rome for twenty years before the arrival of Porphyry, who was destined to become his most famous pupil, as well as his biographer and editor. It was at this time that Plotinus, urged by Porphyry, began to collect his treatises into systematic form, and to compose new ones. These treatises were most likely composed from the material gathered from Plotinus' lectures and debates with his students. The students and attendants of Plotinus' lectures must have varied greatly in philosophical outlook and doctrine, for the Enneads are filled with refutations and corrections of the positions of Peripatetics, Stoics, Epicureans, Gnostics, and Astrologers. Although Plotinus appealed to Plato as the ultimate authority on all things philosophical, he was known to have criticized the master himself (cf. Ennead IV.8.1). We should not make the mistake of interpreting Plotinus as nothing more than a commentator on Plato, albeit a brilliant one. He was an original and profound thinker in his own right, who borrowed and re-worked all that he found useful from earlier thinkers, and even from his opponents, in order to construct the grand dialectical system presented (although in not quite systematic form) in his treatises.  The great thinker died in solitude at Campania in 270 C.E.

The Enneads are the complete treatises of Plotinus, edited by his student, Porphyry. Plotinus wrote these treatises in a crabbed and difficult Greek, and his failing eyesight rendered his penmanship oftentimes barely intelligible. We owe a great debt to Porphyry, for persisting in the patient and careful preservation of these writings. Porphyry divided the treatises of his master into six books of nine treatises each, sometimes arbitrarily dividing a longer work into several separate works in order to fulfill his numerical plan. The standard citation of the Enneads follows Porphyry's division into book, treatise, and chapter. Hence 'IV.8.1' refers to book (or Ennead) four, treatise eight, chapter one.

2. Metaphysics and Cosmology

Plotinus is not a metaphysical thinker in the strict sense of the term. He is often referred to as a 'mystical' thinker, but even this designation fails to express the philosophical rigor of his thought. Jacques Derrida has remarked that the system of Plotinus represents the "closure of metaphysics" as well as the "transgression" of metaphysical thought itself (1973: p. 128 note). The cause for such a remark is that, in order to maintain the strict unity of his cosmology (which must be understood in the 'spiritual' or noetic sense, in addition to the traditional physical sense of 'cosmos') Plotinus emphasizes the displacement or deferral of presence, refusing to locate either the beginning (arkhe) or the end (telos) of existents at any determinate point in the 'chain of emanations' -- the One, the Intelligence, and the Soul -- that is the expression of his cosmological theory; for to predicate presence of his highest principle would imply, for Plotinus, that this principle is but another being among beings, even if it is superior to all beings by virtue of its status as their 'begetter'. Plotinus demands that the highest principle or existent be supremely self-sufficient, disinterested, impassive, etc. However, this highest principle must still, somehow, have a part in the generation of the Cosmos. It is this tension between Plotinus' somewhat religious demand that pure unity and self-presence be the highest form of existence in his cosmology, and the philosophical necessity of accounting for the multiplicity among existents, that animates and lends an excessive complexity and determined rigor to his thought.

Since Being and Life itself, for Plotinus, is characterized by a dialectical return to origins, a process of overcoming the 'strictures' of multiplicity, a theory of the primacy of contemplation (theoria) over against any traditional theories of physically causal beginnings, like what is found in the Pre-Socratic thinkers, and especially in Aristotle's notion of the 'prime mover,' becomes necessary. Plotinus proceeds by setting himself in opposition to these earlier thinkers, and comes to align himself, more or less, with the thought of Plato. However, Plotinus employs allegory in his interpretation of Plato's Dialogues; and this leads him to a highly personal reading of the creation myth in the Timaeus (27c ff.), which serves to bolster his often excessively introspective philosophizing. Plotinus maintains that the power of the Demiurge ('craftsman' of the cosmos), in Plato's myth, is derived not from any inherent creative capacity, but rather from the power of contemplation, and the creative insight it provides (see Enneads IV.8.1-2; III.8.7-8). According to Plotinus, the Demiurge does not actually create anything; what he does is govern the purely passive nature of matter, which is pure passivity itself, by imposing a sensible form (an image of the intelligible forms contained as thoughts within the mind of the Demiurge) upon it. The form (eidos) which is the arkhe or generative or productive principle of all beings, establishes its presence in the physical or sensible realm not through any act, but by virtue of the expressive contemplation of the Demiurge, who is to be identified with the Intelligence or Mind (Nous) in Plotinus' system. Yet this Intelligence cannot be referred to as the primordial source of all existents (although it does hold the place, in Plotinus' cosmology, of first principle), for it, itself, subsists only insofar as it contemplates a prior -- this supreme prior is, according to Plotinus, the One, which is neither being nor essence, but the source, or rather, the possibility of all existence (see Ennead V.2.1). In this capacity, the One is not even a beginning, nor even an end, for it is simply the disinterested orientational 'stanchion' that permits all beings to recognize themselves as somehow other than a supreme 'I'. Indeed, for Plotinus, the Soul is the 'We' (Ennead I.1.7), that is, the separated yet communicable likeness (homoiotai) of existents to the Mind or Intelligence that contemplates the One. This highest level of contemplation -- the Intelligence contemplating the One -- gives birth to the forms (eide), which serve as the referential, contemplative basis of all further existents. The simultaneous inexhaustibility of the One as a generative power, coupled with its elusive and disinterested transcendence, makes the positing of any determinate source or point of origin of existence, in the context of Plotinus' thought, impossible. So the transgression of metaphysical thought, in Plotinus' system, owes its achievement to his grand concept of the One.

a. The One

The 'concept' of the One is not, properly speaking, a concept at all, since it is never explicitly defined by Plotinus, yet it is nevertheless the foundation and grandest expression of his philosophy. Plotinus does make it clear that no words can do justice to the power of the One; even the name, 'the One,' is inadequate, for naming already implies discursive knowledge, and since discursive knowledge divides or separates its objects in order to make them intelligible, the One cannot be known through the process of discursive reasoning (Ennead VI.9.4). Knowledge of the One is achieved through the experience of its 'power' (dunamis) and its nature, which is to provide a 'foundation' (arkhe) and location (topos) for all existents (VI.9.6). The 'power' of the One is not a power in the sense of physical or even mental action; the power of the One, as Plotinus speaks of it, is to be understood as the only adequate description of the 'manifestation' of a supreme principle that, by its very nature, transcends all predication and discursive understanding. This 'power,' then, is capable of being experienced, or known, only through contemplation (theoria), or the purely intellectual 'vision' of the source of all things. The One transcends all beings, and is not itself a being, precisely because all beings owe their existence and subsistence to their eternal contemplation of the dynamic manifestation(s) of the One. The One can be said to be the 'source' of all existents only insofar as every existent naturally and (therefore) imperfectly contemplates the various aspects of the One, as they are extended throughout the cosmos, in the form of either sensible or intelligible objects or existents. The perfect contemplation of the One, however, must not be understood as a return to a primal source; for the One is not, strictly speaking, a source or a cause, but rather the eternally present possibility -- or active making-possible -- of all existence, of Being (V.2.1). According to Plotinus, the unmediated vision of the 'generative power' of the One, to which existents are led by the Intelligence (V.9.2), results in an ecstatic dance of inspiration, not in a satiated torpor (VI.9.8); for it is the nature of the One to impart fecundity to existents -- that is to say: the One, in its regal, indifferent capacity as undiminishable potentiality of Being, permits both rapt contemplation and ecstatic, creative extension. These twin poles, this 'stanchion,' is the manifested framework of existence which the One produces, effortlessly (V.1.6). The One, itself, is best understood as the center about which the 'stanchion,' the framework of the cosmos, is erected (VI.9.8). This 'stanchion' or framework is the result of the contemplative activity of the Intelligence.

i. Emanation and Multiplicity

The One cannot, strictly speaking, be referred to as a source or a cause, since these terms imply movement or activity, and the One, being totally self-sufficient, has no need of acting in a creative capacity (VI.9.8). Yet Plotinus still maintains that the One somehow 'emanates' or 'radiates' existents. This is accomplished because the One effortlessly "'overflows' and its excess begets an other than itself" (V.2.1, tr. O'Brien 1964) -- this 'other' is the Intelligence (Nous), the source of the realm of multiplicity, of Being. However, the question immediately arises as to why the One, being so perfect and self-sufficient, should have any need or even any 'ability' to emanate or generate anything other than itself. In attempting to answer this question, Plotinus finds it necessary to appeal, not to reason, but to the non-discursive, intuitive faculty of the soul; this he does by calling for a sort of prayer, an invocation of the deity, that will permit the soul to lift itself up to the unmediated, direct, and intimate contemplation of that which exceeds it (V.1.6). When the soul is thus prepared for the acceptance of the revelation of the One, a very simple truth manifests itself: that what, from our vantage-point, may appear as an act of emanation on the part of the One, is really the effect, the necessary life-giving supplement, of the disinterested self-sufficiency that both belongs to and is the One. "In turning toward itself The One sees. It is this seeing that constitutes The Intelligence" (V.1.7, tr. O'Brien). Therefore, since the One accomplishes the generation or emanation of multiplicity, or Being, by simply persisting in its state of eternal self-presence and impassivity, it cannot be properly called a 'first principle,' since it is at once beyond number, and that which makes possible all number or order (cf. V.1.5).

ii. Presence

Since the One is self-sufficient, isolated by virtue of its pure self-presence, and completely impassive, it cannot properly be referred to as an 'object' of contemplation -- not even for the Intelligence. What the Intelligence contemplates is not, properly speaking, the One Itself, but rather the generative power that emanates, effortlessly, from the One, which is beyond all Being and Essence (epikeina tes ousias) (cf. V.2.1). It has been stated above that the One cannot properly be referred to as a first principle, since it has no need to divide itself or produce a multiplicity in any manner whatsoever, since the One is purely self-contained. This leads Plotinus to posit a secondary existent or emanation of the One, the Intelligence or Mind (Nous) which is the result of the One's direct 'vision' of itself (V.1.7). This allows Plotinus to maintain, within his cosmological schema, a power of pure unity or presence -- the One -- that is nevertheless never purely present, except as a trace in the form of the power it manifests, which is known through contemplation. Pure power and self-presence, for Plotinus, cannot reside in a being capable of generative action, for it is a main tenet of Plotinus' system that the truly perfect existent cannot create or generate anything, since this would imply a lack on the part of that existent. Therefore, in order to account for the generation of the cosmos, Plotinus had to locate his first principle at some indeterminate point outside of the One and yet firmly united with it; this first principle, of course, is the Intelligence, which contains both unity and multiplicity, identity and difference -- in other words, a self-presence that is capable of being divided into manifestable and productive forms or 'intelligences' (logoi spermatikoi) without, thereby, losing its unity. The reason that the Intelligence, which is the truly productive 'first principle' (proton arkhon) in Plotinus' system, can generate existents and yet remain fully present to itself and at rest, is because the self-presence and nature of the Intelligence is derived from the One, which gives of itself infinitely, and without diminishing itself in any way. Furthermore, since every being or existent within Plotinus' Cosmos owes its nature as existent to a power that is prior to it, and which it contemplates, every existent owes its being to that which stands over it, in the capacity of life-giving power. Keeping this in mind, it is difficult, if not impossible, to speak of presence in the context of Plotinus' philosophy; rather, we must speak of varying degrees or grades of contemplation, all of which refer back to the pure trace of infinite power that is the One.

b. The Intelligence

The Intelligence (Nous) is the true first principle -- the determinate, referential 'foundation' (arkhe) -- of all existents; for it is not a self-sufficient entity like the One, but rather possesses the ability or capacity to contemplate both the One, as its prior, as well as its own thoughts, which Plotinus identifies with the Platonic Ideas or Forms (eide). The purpose or act of the Intelligence is twofold: to contemplate the 'power' (dunamis) of the One, which the Intelligence recognizes as its source, and to meditate upon the thoughts that are eternally present to it, and which constitute its very being. The Intelligence is distinct from the One insofar as its act is not strictly its own (or an expression of self-sufficiency as the 'act' of self-reflection is for the One) but rather results in the principle of order and relation that is Being -- for the Intelligence and Being are identical (V.9.8). The Intelligence may be understood as the storehouse of potential being(s), but only if every potential being is also recognized as an eternal and unchangeable thought in the Divine Mind (Nous). As Plotinus maintains, the Intelligence is an independent existent, requiring nothing outside of itself for subsistence; invoking Parmenides, Plotinus states that "to think and to be are one and the same" (V.9.5; Parmenides, fragment 3). The being of the Intelligence is its thought, and the thought of the Intelligence is Being. It is no accident that Plotinus also refers to the Intelligence as God (theos) or the Demiurge (I.1.8), for the Intelligence, by virtue of its primal duality -- contemplating both the One and its own thought -- is capable of acting as a determinate source and point of contemplative reference for all beings. In this sense, the Intelligence may be said to produce creative or constitutive action, which is the provenance of the Soul.

i. The Ideas and the 'Seminal Reasons'

Since the purpose or act of the Intelligence is twofold (as described above), that which comprises the being or essence of the Intelligence must be of a similar nature. That which the Intelligence contemplates, and by virtue of which it maintains its existence, is the One in the capacity of overflowing power or impassive source. This power or effortless expression of the One, which is, in the strictest sense, the Intelligence itself, is manifested as a coherency of thoughts or perfect intellectual objects that the Intelligence contemplates eternally and fully, and by virtue of which it persists in Being -- these are the Ideas (eide). The Ideas reside in the Intelligence as objects of contemplation. Plotinus states that: "No Idea is different from The Intelligence but is itself an intelligence" (V.9.8, tr. O'Brien). Without in any way impairing the unity of his concept of the Intelligence, Plotinus is able to locate both permanence and eternality, and the necessary fecundity of Being, at the level of Divinity. He accomplishes this by introducing the notion that the self-identity of each Idea, its indistinguishability from Intelligence itself, makes of each Idea at once a pure and complete existent, as well as a potentiality or 'seed' capable of further extending itself into actualization as an entity distinct from the Intelligence (cf. V.9.14). Borrowing the Stoic term logos spermatikos or 'seminal reason,' Plotinus elaborates his theory that every determinate existent is produced or generated through the contemplation by its prior of a higher source, as we have seen that the One, in viewing itself, produces the Intelligence; and so, through the contemplation of the One via the Ideas, the Intelligence produces the logoi spermatikoi ('seminal reasons') that will serve as the productive power or essence of the Soul, which is the active or generative principle within Being (cf. V.9.6-7).

ii. Being and Life

Being, for Plotinus, is not some abstract, amorphous pseudo-concept that is somehow pre-supposed by all thinking. In the context of Plotinus' cosmological schema, Being is given a determined and prominent place, even if it is not given, explicitly, a definition; though he does relate it to the One, by saying that the One is not Being, but "being's begetter" (V.2.1). Although Being does not, for Plotinus, pre-suppose thought, it does pre-suppose and make possible all 're-active' or causal generation. Being is necessarily fecund -- that is to say, it generates or actualizes all beings, insofar as all beings are contained, as potentialities, in the 'rational seeds' which are the results of the thought or contemplation of the Intelligence. Being differentiates the unified thought of the Intelligence -- that is, makes it repeatable and meaningful for those existents which must proceed from the Intelligence as the Intelligence proceeds from the One. Being is the principle of relation and distinguishability amongst the Ideas, or rather, it is that rational principle which makes them logoi spermatikoi. However, Being is not simply the productive capacity of Difference; it is also the source of independence and self-sameness of all existents proceeding from the Intelligence; the productive unity accomplished through the rational or dialectical synthesis of the Dyad -- of the Same (tauton) and the Different (heteron) (cf. V.1.4-5). We may best understand Being, in the context of Plotinus' thought, by saying that it differentiates and makes indeterminate the Ideas belonging to the Intelligence, only in order to return these divided or differentiated ideas, now logoi spermatikoi, to Sameness or Unity. It is the process of returning the divided and differentiated ideas to their original place in the chain of emanation that constitutes Life or temporal existence. The existence thus produced by or through Being, and called Life, is a mode of intellectual existence characterized by discursive thought, or that manner of thinking which divides the objects of thought in order to categorize them and make them knowable through the relational process of categorization or 'orderly differentiation'. The existents that owe their life to the process of Being are capable of knowing individual existents only as they relate to one another, and not as they relate to themselves (in the capacity of 'self-sameness'). This is discursive knowledge, and is an imperfect image of the pure knowledge of the Intelligence, which knows all beings in their essence or 'self-sameness' -- that is, as they are purely present to the Mind, without the articulative mediation of Difference.

c. The Soul

The power of the One, as explained above, is to provide a foundation (arkhe) and location (topos) for all existents (VI.9.6). The foundation provided by the One is the Intelligence. The location in which the cosmos takes objective shape and determinate, physical form, is the Soul (cf. IV.3.9). Since the Intelligence, through its contemplation of the One and reflection on its own contents, the Ideas (eide), is both one and many, the Soul is both contemplative and active: it contemplates the Intelligence, its prior in the 'chain of existents,' and also extends itself, through acting upon or actualizing its own thoughts (the logoi spermatikoi), into the darkness or indeterminacy of multiplicity or Difference (which is to be identified in this sense with Matter); and by so doing, the Soul comes to generate a separate, material cosmos that is the living image of the spiritual or noetic Cosmos contained as a unified thought within the Intelligence (cp. Plato, Timaeus 37d). The Soul, like the Intelligence, is a unified existent, in spite of its dual capacity as contemplator and actor. The purely contemplative part of the Soul, which remains in constant contact with the Intelligence, is referred to by Plotinus as the 'higher part' of the Soul, while that part which actively descends into the changeable (or sensible) realm in order to govern and directly craft the Cosmos, is the 'lower part,' which assumes a state of division as it enters, out of necessity, material bodies. It is at the level of the Soul that the drama of existence unfolds; the Soul, through coming into contact with its inferior, that is, matter or pure passivity, is temporarily corrupted, and forgets the fact that it is one of the Intelligibles, owing its existence to the Intelligence, as its prior, and ultimately, to the power of the One. It may be said that the Soul is the 'shepherd' or 'cultivator' of the logoi spermatikoi, insofar as the Soul's task is to conduct the differentiated ideas from the state of fecund multiplicity that is Being, through the drama of Life, and at last, to return these ideas to their primal state or divine status as thoughts within the Intelligence. Plotinus, holding to his principle that one cannot act without being affected by that which one acts upon, declares that the Soul, in its lower part, undergoes the drama of existence, suffers, forgets, falls into vice, etc., while the higher part remains unaffected, and persists in governing, without flaw, the Cosmos, while ensuring that all individual, embodied souls return, eventually, to their divine and true state within the Intelligible Realm. Moreover, since every embodied soul forgets, to some extent, its origin in the Divine Realm, the drama of return consists of three distinct steps: the cultivation of Virtue, which reminds the soul of the divine Beauty; the practice of Dialectic, which instructs or informs the soul concerning its priors and the true nature of existence; and finally, Contemplation, which is the proper act and mode of existence of the soul.

i. Virtue

The Soul, in its highest part, remains essentially and eternally a being in the Divine, Intelligible Realm. Yet the lower (or active), governing part of the Soul, while remaining, in its essence, a divine being and identical to the Highest Soul, nevertheless, through its act, falls into forgetfulness of its prior, and comes to attach itself to the phenomena of the realm of change, that is, of Matter. This level at which the Soul becomes fragmented into individual, embodied souls, is Nature (phusis). Since the purpose of the soul is to maintain order in the material realm, and since the essence of the soul is one with the Highest Soul, there will necessarily persist in the material realm a type of order (doxa) that is a pale reflection of the Order (logos) persisting in the Intelligible Realm. It is this secondary or derived order (doxa) that gives rise to what Plotinus calls the "civic virtues" (aretas politikas) (I.2.1). The "civic virtues" may also be called the 'natural virtues' (aretas phusikas) (I.3.6), since they are attainable and recognizable by reflection upon human nature, without any explicit reference to the Divine. These 'lesser' virtues are possible, and attainable, even by the soul that has forgotten its origin within the Divine, for they are merely the result of the imitation of virtuous men -- that is, the imitation of the Nature of the Divine Soul, as it is actualized in living existents, yet not realizing that it is such. There is nothing wrong, Plotinus tells us, with imitating noble men, but only if this imitation is understood for what it is: a preparation for the attainment of the true Virtue that is "likeness to God as far as possible" (cf. I.1.2; and Plato, Theaetetus 176b). Plotinus makes it clear that the one who possesses the civic virtues does not necessarily possess the Divine Virtue, but the one who possesses the latter will necessarily possess the former (I.2.7). Those who imitate virtuous men, for example, the heroes of old, like Achilles, and take pride in this virtue, run the risk of mistaking the merely human for the Divine, and therefore committing the sin of hubris. Furthermore, the one who mistakes the human for the Divine virtue remains firmly fixed in the realm of opinion (doxa), and is unable to rise to true knowledge of the Intelligible Realm, which is also knowledge of one's true self. The exercise of the civic virtues makes one just, courageous, well-tempered, etc. -- that is, the civic virtues result in sophrosune, or a well-ordered and cultivated mind. It is easy to see, however, that this virtue is simply the ability to remain, to an extent, unaffected by the negative intrusions upon the soul of the affections of material existence. The highest Virtue consists, on the other hand, not in a rearguard defense, as it were, against the attack of violent emotions and disruptive desires, but rather in a positively active and engaged effort to regain one's forgotten divinity (I.2.6). The highest virtue, then, is the preparation for the exercise of Dialectic, which is the tool of divine ordering wielded by the individual soul.

ii. Dialectic

Dialectic is the tool wielded by the individual soul as it seeks to attain the unifying knowledge of the Divinity; but dialectic is not, for that matter, simply a tool. It is also the most valuable part of philosophy (I.3.5), for it places all things in an intelligible order, by and through which they may be known as they are, without the contaminating diversity characteristic of the sensible realm, which is the result of the necessary manifestation of discursive knowledge -- language. We may best understand dialectic, as Plotinus conceives it, as the process of gradual extraction, from the ordered multiplicity of language, of a unifying principle conducive to contemplation. The soul accomplishes this by alternating "between synthesis and analysis until it has gone through the entire domain of the intelligible and has arrived at the principle" (I.3.4, tr. O'Brien). This is to say, on the one hand, that dialectic dissolves the tension of differentiation that makes each existent a separate entity, and therefore something existing apart from the Intelligence; and, on the other hand, that dialectic is the final flourish of discursive reasoning, which, by 'analyzing the synthesis,' comes to a full realization of itself as the principle of order among all that exists -- that is, a recognition of the essential unity of the Soul (cf. IV.1). The individual soul accomplishes this ultimate act by placing itself in the space of thinking that is "beyond being" (epekeina tou ontos) (I.3.5). At this point, the soul is truly capable of living a life as a being that is "at one and the same time ... debtor to what is above and ... benefactor to what is below" (IV.8.7, tr. O'Brien). This the soul accomplishes through the purely intellectual 'act' of Contemplation.

iii. Contemplation

Once the individual soul has, through its own act of will -- externalized through dialectic -- freed itself from the influence of Being, and has arrived at a knowledge of itself as the ordering principle of the cosmos, it has united its act and its thought in one supreme ordering principle (logos) which derives its power from Contemplation (theoria). In one sense, contemplation is simply a vision of the things that are -- a viewing of existence. However, for Plotinus, contemplation is the single 'thread' uniting all existents, for contemplation, on the part of any given individual existent, is at the same time knowledge of self, of subordinate, and of prior. Contemplation is the 'power' uniting the One, the Intelligence, and the Soul in a single all-productive intellectual force to which all existents owe their life. 'Vision' (theoria), for Plotinus, whether intellectual or physical, implies not simply possession of the viewed object in or by the mind, but also an empowerment, given by the object of vision to the one who has viewed it. Therefore, through the 'act' of contemplation the soul becomes capable of simultaneously knowing its prior (the source of its power, the Intelligence) and, of course, of ordering or imparting life to that which falls below the soul in the order of existence. The extent to which Plotinus identifies contemplation with a creative or vivifying act is expressed most forcefully in his comment that: "since the supreme realities devote themselves to contemplation, all other beings must aspire to it, too, because the origin of all things is their end as well" (III.8.7, tr. O'Brien). This means that even brute action is a form of contemplation, for even the most vulgar or base act has, at its base and as its cause, the impulse to contemplate the greater. Since Plotinus recognizes no strict principle of cause and effect in his cosmology, he is forced, as it were, to posit a strictly intellectual process -- contemplation -- as a force capable of producing the necessary tension amongst beings in order for there to be at once a sort of hierarchy and, also, a unity within the cosmos. The tension, of course, is always between knower and known, and manifests itself in the form of a 'fall' that is also a forgetting of source, which requires remedy. The remedy is, as we have seen, the exercise of virtue and dialectic (also, see above). For once the soul has walked the ways of discursive knowledge, and accomplished, via dialectic, the necessary unification, it (the soul) becomes the sole principle of order within the realm of changeable entities, and, through the fragile synthesis of differentiation and unity accomplished by dialectic, and actualized in contemplation, holds the cosmos together in a bond of purely intellectual dependence, as of thinker to thought. The tension that makes all of this possible is the simple presence of the pure passivity that is Matter.

d. Matter

Matter, for Plotinus, may be understood as an eternally receptive substratum (hupokeimenon), in and by which all determinate existents receive their form (cf. II.4.4). Since Matter is completely passive, it is capable of receiving any and all forms, and is therefore the principle of differentiation among existents. According to Plotinus, there are two types of Matter -- the intelligible and the sensible. The intelligible type is identified as the palette upon which the various colors and hues of intelligible Being are made visible or presented, while the sensible type is the 'space of the possible,' the excessively fecund 'darkness' or depth of indeterminacy into which the soul shines its vivifying light. Matter, then, is the ground or fundament of Being, insofar as the entities within the Intelligence (the logoi spermatikoi) depend upon this defining or delimiting principle for their articulation or actualization into determinate and independent intelligences; and even in the sensible realm, where the soul achieves its ultimate end in the 'exhaustion' that is brute activity -- the final and lowest form of contemplation (cf. III.8.2) -- Matter is that which receives and, in a passive sense, 'gives form to' the act. Since every existent, as Plotinus tells us, must produce another, in a succession of dependence and derivation (IV.8.6) which finally ends, simultaneously, in the passivity and formlessness of Matter, and the desperation of the physical act, as opposed to purely intellectual contemplation (although, it must be noted, even brute activity is a form of contemplation, as described above), Matter, and the result of its reception of action, is not inherently evil, but is only so in relation to the soul, and the extent to which the soul becomes bound to Matter through its act (I.8.14). Plotinus also maintains, in keeping with Platonic doctrine, that any sensible thing is an image of its true and eternal counterpart in the Intelligible Realm. Therefore, the sensible matter in the cosmos is but an image of the purely intellectual Matter existing or persisting, as noetic substratum, within the Intelligence (nous). Since this is the case, the confusion into which the soul is thrown by its contact with pure passivity is not eternal or irremediable, but rather a necessary and final step in the drama of Life, for once the soul has experienced the 'chaotic passivity' of material existence, it will yearn ever more intensely for union with its prior, and the pure contemplation that constitutes its true existence (IV.8.5).

i. Evil

The Soul's act, as we have seen (above), is dual -- it both contemplates its prior, and acts, in a generative or, more properly, a governing capacity. For the soul that remains in contact with its prior, that is, with the highest part of the Soul, the ordering of material existence is accomplished through an effortless governing of indeterminacy, which Plotinus likens to a light shining into and illuminating a dark space (cf. I.8.14); however, for the soul that becomes sundered, through forgetfulness, from its prior, there is no longer an ordering act, but a generative or productive act -- this is the beginning of physical existence, which Plotinus recognizes as nothing more than a misplaced desire for the Good (cf. III.5.1). The soul that finds its fulfillment in physical generation is the soul that has lost its power to govern its inferior while remaining in touch with the source of its power, through the act of contemplation. But that is not all: the soul that seeks its end in the means of generation and production is also the soul that becomes affected by what it has produced -- this is the source of unhappiness, of hatred, indeed, of Evil (kakon). For when the soul is devoid of any referential or orientational source -- any claim to rulership over matter -- it becomes the slave to that over which it should rule, by divine right, as it were. And since Matter is pure impassivity, the depth or darkness capable of receiving all form and of being illuminated by the light of the soul, of reason (logos), when the soul comes under the sway of Matter, through its tragic forgetting of its source, it becomes like this substratum -- it is affected by any and every emotion or event that comes its way, and all but loses its divinity. Evil, then, is at once a subjective or 'psychic' event, and an ontological condition, insofar as the soul is the only existent capable of experiencing evil, and is also, in its highest form, the ruler or ordering principle of the material cosmos. In spite of all this, however, Evil is not, for Plotinus, a meaningless plague upon the soul. He makes it clear that the soul, insofar as it must rule over Matter, must also take on certain characteristics of that Matter in order to subdue it (I.8.8). The onto-theological problem of the source of Evil, and any theodicy required by placing the source of Evil within the godhead, is avoided by Plotinus, for he makes it clear that Evil affects only the soul, as it carries out its ordering activity within the realm of change and decay that is the countenance of Matter. Since the soul is, necessarily, both contemplative and active, it is also capable of falling, through weakness or the 'contradiction' of its dual functions, into entrapment or confusion amidst the chaos of pure passivity that is Matter. Evil, however, is not irremediable, since it is merely the result of privation (the soul's privation, through forgetfulness, of its prior); and so Evil is remedied by the soul's experience of Love.

ii. Love and Happiness

Plotinus speaks of Love in a manner that is more 'cosmic' than what we normally associate with that term. Love (eros), for Plotinus, is an ontological condition, experienced by the soul that has forgotten its true status as divine governor of the material realm and now longs for its true condition. Drawing on Plato, Plotinus reminds us that Love (Eros) is the child of Poverty (Penia) and Possession (Poros) (cf. Plato, Symposium 203b-c), since the soul that has become too intimately engaged with the material realm, and has forgotten its source, is experiencing a sort of 'poverty of being,' and longs to possess that which it has 'lost'. This amounts to a spiritual desire, an 'existential longing,' although the result of this desire is not always the 'instant salvation' or turnabout that Plotinus recognizes as the ideal (the epistrophe described in Ennead IV.8.4, for example); oftentimes the soul expresses its desire through physical generation or reproduction. This is, for Plotinus, but a pale and inadequate reflection or imitation of the generative power available to the soul through contemplation. Now Plotinus does not state that human affection or even carnal love is an evil in itself -- it is only an evil when the soul recognizes it as the only expression or end (telos) of its desire (III.5.1). The true or noble desire or love is for pure beauty, i.e., the intelligible Beauty (noetos kalon) made known by contemplation (theoria). Since this Beauty is unchangeable, and the source of all earthly or material, i.e., mutable, beauty, the soul will find true happiness (eudaimonia) when it attains an unmediated vision (theoria) of Beauty. Once the soul attains not only perception of this beauty (which comes to it only through the senses) but true knowledge of the source of Beauty, it will recognize itself as identical with the highest Soul, and will discover that its embodiment and contact with matter was a necessary expression of the Being of the Intelligence, since, as Plotinus clearly states, as long as there is a possibility for the existence and engendering of further beings, the Soul must continue to act and bring forth existents (cf. IV.8.3-4) -- even if this means a temporary lapse into evil on the part of the individual or 'fragmented' souls that actively shape and govern matter. However, it must be kept in mind that even the soul's return to recognition of its true state, and the resultant happiness it experiences, are not merely episodes in the inner life of an individual existent, but rather cosmic events in themselves, insofar as the activities and experiences of the souls in the material realm contribute directly to the maintenance of the cosmos. It is the individual soul's capacity to align itself with material existence, and through its experiences to shape and provide an image of eternity for this purely passive substance, that constitutes Nature (phusis). The soul's turnabout or epistrophe, while being the occasion of its happiness, reached through the desire that is Love, is not to be understood as an apokatastasis or 'restoration' of a fragmented cosmos. Rather, we must understand this process of the Soul's fragmentation into individual souls, its resultant experiences of evil and love, and its eventual attainment of happiness, as a necessary and eternal movement taking place at the final point of emanation of the power that is the One, manifested in the Intelligence, and activated, generatively, at the level of Soul.

iii. A Note on Nature (phusis)

One final statement must be made, before we exit this section on Plotinus' Metaphysics and Cosmology, concerning the status of Nature in this schema. Nature, for Plotinus, is not a separate power or principle of Life that may be understood independently of the Soul and its relation to Matter. Also, since the reader of this article may find it odd that I would choose to discuss 'Love and Happiness' in the context of a general metaphysics, let it be stated clearly that the Highest Soul, and all the individual souls, form a single, indivisible entity, The Soul (psuche) (IV.1.1), and that all which affects the individual souls in the material realm is a direct and necessary outgrowth of the Being of the Intelligible Cosmos (I.1.8). Therefore, it follows that Nature, in Plotinus' system, is only correctly understood when it is viewed as the result of the collective experience of each and every individual soul, which Plotinus refers to as the 'We' (emeis) (I.1.7) -- an experience, moreover, which is the direct result of the souls fragmentation into bodies in order to govern and shape Matter. For Matter, as Plotinus tells us, is such that the divine Soul cannot enter into contact with it without taking on certain of its qualities; and since it is of the nature of the Highest Soul to remain in contemplative contact with the Intelligence, it cannot descend, as a whole, into the depths of material differentiation. So the Soul divides itself, as it were, between pure contemplation and generative or governing act -- it is the movement or moment of the soul's act that results in the differentiation of the active part of Soul into bodies. It must be understood, however, that this differentiation does not constitute a separate Soul, for as we have already seen, the nature and essence of all intelligible beings deriving from the One is twofold -- for the Intelligence, it is the ability to know or contemplate the power of the One, and to reflect upon that knowledge; for the Soul it is to contemplate the Intelligence, and to give active form to the ideas derived from that contemplation. The second part of the Soul's nature or essence involves governing Matter, and therefore becoming an entity at once contemplative and unified, and active and divided. So when Plotinus speaks of the 'lower soul,' he is not speaking of Nature, but rather of that ability or capacity of the Soul to be affected by its actions. Since contemplation, for Plotinus, can be both purely noetic and accomplished in repose, and 'physical' and carried out in a state of external effort, so reflection can be both noetic and physical or affective. Nature, then, is to be understood as the Soul reflecting upon the active or physical part of its eternal contemplation. The discussion of Plotinus' psychological and epistemological theories, which now follows, must be read as a reflection upon the experiences of the Soul, in its capacity or state as fragmented and active unity.

3. Psychology and Epistemology

Plotinus' contributions to the philosophical understanding of the individual psyche, of personality and sense-perception, and the essential question of how we come to know what we know, cannot be properly understood or appreciated apart from his cosmological and metaphysical theories. However, the Enneads do contain more than a few treatises and passages that deal explicitly with what we today would refer to as psychology and epistemology. Plotinus is usually spurred on in such investigations by three over-arching questions and difficulties: (1) how the immaterial soul comes to be united with a material body, (2) whether all souls are one, and (3) whether the higher part of the soul is to be held responsible for the misdeeds of the lower part. Plotinus responds to the first difficulty by employing a metaphor. The Soul, he tells us, is like an eternal and pure light whose single ray comes to be refracted through a prism; this prism is matter. The result of this refraction is that the single ray is 'fragmented' into various and multi-colored rays, which give the appearance of being unique and separate rays of light, but yet owe their source to the single pure ray of light that has come to illumine the formerly dark 'prism' of matter.

If the single ray of light were to remain the same, or rather, if it were to refuse to illuminate matter, its power would be limited. Although Plotinus insists that all souls are one by virtue of owing their being to a single source, they do become divided amongst bodies out of necessity -- for that which is pure and perfectly impassive cannot unite with pure passivity (matter) and still remain itself. Therefore, the Higher Soul agrees, as it were, to illuminate matter, which has everything to gain and nothing to lose by the union, being wholly incapable of engendering anything on its own. Yet it must be remembered that for Plotinus the Higher Soul is capable of giving its light to matter without in any way becoming diminished, since the Soul owes its own being to the Intelligence which it contemplates eternally and effortlessly. The individual souls -- the 'fragmented rays of light' -- though their source is purely impassive, and hence not responsible for any misdeeds they may perform, or any misfortunes that may befalls them in their incarnation, must, themselves, take on certain characteristics of matter in order to illuminate it, or as Plotinus also says, to govern it. One of these characteristics is a certain level of passivity, or the ability to be affected by the turbulence of matter as it groans and labors under the vivifying power of the soul, as though in the pangs of childbirth (cf. Plato, Letter II. 313a). This is the beginning of the individual soul's personality, for it is at this point that the soul is capable of experiencing such emotions like anger, fear, passion, love, etc. This individual soul now comes to be spoken of by Plotinus as if it were a separate entity by. However, it must be remembered that even the individual and unique soul, in its community (koinon) with a material body, never becomes fully divided from its eternal and unchanging source.  This union of a unique, individual soul (which owes its being to its eternal source) with a material body is called by Plotinus the living being (zoon). The living being remains, always, a contemplative being, for it owes its existence to a prior, intelligible principle; but the mode of contemplation on the part of the living being is divided into three distinct stages, rising from a lesser to a greater level of intelligible ordering. These stages are: (1) pathos, or the immediate disturbance undergone by the soul through the vicissitudes of its union with matter, (2) the moment at which the disturbance becomes an object of intelligible apprehension (antilepsis), and (3) the moment at which the intelligible object (tupon) becomes perceived through the reasoning faculty (dianoia) of the soul, and duly ordered or judged (krinein). Plotinus call this three-fold structure, in its unity, sense- perception (aisthesis).

We may best understand Plotinus' theory of perception by describing it as a 'creation' of intelligible objects, or forms, from the raw material (hule) provided by the corporeal realm of sensation.  The individual souls then use these created objects as tools by which to order or govern the turbulent realm of vivified matter. The problem arises when the soul is forced to think 'through' or with the aid of these constructed images of the forms (eide), these 'types' (tupoi). This is the manner of discursive reasoning that Plotinus calls dianoia, and which consists in an act of understanding that owes its knowledge (episteme) to objects external to the mind, which the mind, through sense-perception, has come to 'grasp' (lepsis). Now since the objects which the mind comes to 'grasp' are the product of a soul that has mingled, to a certain extent, with matter, or passivity, the knowledge gained by dianoia can only be opinion (doxa). The opinion may indeed be a correct one, but if it is not subject to the judgment of the higher part of the soul, it cannot properly be called true knowledge (alethes gnosis). Furthermore, the reliance on the products of sense-perception and on dianoia may lead the soul to error and to forgetfulness of its true status as one with its source, the Higher Soul. And although even the soul that falls the furthest into error and forgetfulness is still, potentially, one with the Higher Soul, it will be subject to judgment and punishment after death, which takes the form, for Plotinus, of reincarnation. The soul's salvation consists of bringing its mind back into line with the reasoning power (logos) of its source, which it also is -- the Soul. All order in the physical cosmos proceeds from the power of the Soul, and the existence of individual souls is simply the manner in which the Soul exercises its governing power over the realm of passive nature. When the individual soul forgets this primal reality or truth -- that it is the principle of order and reason in the cosmos -- it will look to the products of sense-perception for its knowledge, and will ultimately allow itself to be shaped by its experiences, instead of using its experiences as tools for shaping the cosmos.

a. The Living Being

What Plotinus calls the "living being" (zoon) is what we would refer to, roughly, as the human-being, or the individual possessed of a distinct personality. This being is the product of the union of the lower or active part of the soul with a corporeal body, which is in turn presided over by the Higher Soul, in its capacity as reasoning power, imparted to all individual souls through their ceaseless contemplation of their source (I.1.5-7). The "living being," then, may be understood as a dual nature comprising a lower or physically receptive part, which is responsible for transferring to the perceptive faculty the sensations produced in the lower or 'irrational' part of the soul through its contact with matter (the body), and a higher or 'rational' part which perceives these sensations and passes judgment on them, as it were, thereby producing that lower form of knowledge called episteme in Greek, that is contrasted with the higher knowledge, gnosis, which is the sole possession of the Higher Soul. Plotinus also refers to this dual nature as the 'We' (emeis), for although the individual souls are in a sense divided and differentiated through their prismatic fragmentation (cf. I.1.8, IV.3.4, and IV.9.5), they remain in contact by virtue of their communal contemplation of their prior -- this is the source of their unity. One must keep in mind, however, that the individual souls and the Higher Soul are not two separate orders or types of soul, nor is the "living being" a third entity derived from them. These terms are employed by Plotinus for the sole purpose of making clear the various aspects of the Soul's governing action, which is the final stage of emanation proceeding from the Intelligence's contemplation of the power of the One. The "living being" occupies the lowest level of rational, contemplative existence. It is the purpose of the "living being" to govern the fluctuating nature of matter by receiving its impressions, and turning them into intelligible forms for the mind of the soul to contemplate, and make use of, in its ordering of the cosmos. Now in order to receive the impressions or sensations from material existence, the soul must take on certain characteristics of matter (I.8.8-9) -- the foremost characteristic being that of passivity, or the ability to undergo disruptions in one's being, and remain affected by these disturbances. Therefore, a part of the "living being" will, of necessity, descend too far into the material or changeable realm, and will come to unite with its opposite (that is, pure passivity) to the point that it falls away from the vivifying power of the Soul, or the reasoning principle of the 'We.' In order to understand how this occurs, how it is remedied, and what are the consequences for the Soul and the cosmos that it governs, a few words must be said concerning sense-perception and memory.

b. Sense-Perception and Memory

Sense-perception, as Plotinus conceives it, may be described as the production and cultivation of images (of the forms residing in the Intelligence, and contemplated by the Soul). These images aid the soul in its act of governing the passive, and for that reason disorderly, realm of matter. The soul's experience of bodily sensation (pathos) is an experience of something alien to it, for the soul remains always what it is: an intellectual being. However, as has already been stated, in order for the soul to govern matter, it must take on certain of matter's characteristics. The soul accomplishes this by 'translating' the immediate disturbances of the body -- i.e., physical pain, emotional disturbances, even physical love or lust -- into intelligible realties (noeta) (cf. I.1.7). These intelligible realities are then contemplated by the soul as 'types' (tupoi) of the true images (eidolon) 'produced' through the Soul's eternal contemplation of the Intelligence, by virtue of which the cosmos persists and subsists as a living image of the eternal Cosmos that is the Intelligible Realm. The individual souls order or govern the material realm by bringing these 'types' before the Higher Soul in an act of judgment (krinein), which completes the movement or moment of sense-perception (aisthesis). This perception, then, is not a passive imprinting or 'stamping' of a sensible image upon a receptive soul; rather, it is an action of the soul, indicative of the soul's natural, productive power (cf. IV.6.3). This 'power' is indistinguishable from memory (mnemes), for it involves, as it were, a recollection, on the part of the lower soul, of certain 'innate' ideas, by which it is able to perceive what it perceives -- and most importantly, by virtue of which it is able to know what it knows. The soul falls into error only when it 'falls in love' with the 'types' of the true images it already contains, in its higher part, and mistakes these 'types' for realities. When this occurs, the soul will make judgments independently of its higher part, and will fall into 'sin' (hamartia), that is, it will 'miss the mark' of right governance, which is its proper nature. Since such a 'fallen' soul is almost a separate being (for it has ceased to fully contemplate its 'prior,' or higher part), it will be subject to the 'judgment' of the Higher Soul, and will be forced to endure a chain of incarnations in various bodies, until it finally remembers its 'true self,' and turns its mind back to the contemplation of its higher part, and returns to its natural state (cf. IV.8.4). This movement is necessary for the maintenance of the cosmos, since, as Plotinus tells us, "the totality of things cannot continue limited to the intelligible so long as a succession of further existents is possible; although less perfect, they necessarily are because the prior existent necessarily is" (IV.8.3, tr. O'Brien). No soul can govern matter and remain unaffected by the contact. However, Plotinus assures us that the Highest Soul remains unaffected by the fluctuations and chaotic affections of matter, for it never ceases to productively contemplate its prior -- which is to say: it never leaves its proper place. It is for this reason that even the souls that 'fall' remain part of the unity of the 'We,' for despite any forgetfulness that may occur on their part, they continue to owe their persistence in being to the presence of their higher part -- the Soul (cf. IV.1 and IV.2, "On the Essence of the Soul").

c. Individuality and Personality

The individual souls that are disseminated throughout the cosmos, and the Soul that presides over the cosmos, are, according to Plotinus, an essential unity. This is not to say that he denies the unique existence of the individual soul, nor what we would call a personality. However, personality, for Plotinus, is something accrued, an addition of alien elements that come to be attached to the pure soul through its assimilative contact with matter (cf. IV.7.10, and cp. Plato, Republic 611b-612a). In other words, we may say that the personality is, for Plotinus, a by-product of the soul's governance of matter -- a governance that requires a certain degree of affectivity between the vivifying soul and its receptive substratum (hupokeimenon). The soul is not really 'acted upon' by matter, but rather receives from the matter it animates, certain unavoidable impulses (horme) which come to limit or bind (horos) the soul in such a way as to make of it a "particular being," possessing the illusory quality of being distinct from its source, the Soul. Plotinus does, however, maintain that each "particular being" is the product, as it were, of an intelligence (a logos spermatikos), and that the essential quality of each 'psychic manifestation' is already inscribed as a thought with the cosmic Mind (Nous); yet he makes it clear that it is only the essence (ousia) of the individual soul that is of Intelligible origin (V.7.1-3). The peculiar qualities of each individual, derived from contact with matter, are discardable accruements that only serve to distort the true nature of the soul. It is for this reason that the notion of the 'autonomy of the individual' plays no part in the dialectical onto-theology of Plotinus. The sole purpose of the individual soul is to order the fluctuating representations of the material realm, through the proper exercise of sense-perception, and to remain, as far as is possible, in imperturbable contact with its prior. The lower part of the soul, the seat of the personality, is an unfortunate but necessary supplement to the Soul's actualization of the ideas it contemplates. Through the soul's 'gift' of determinate order to the pure passivity that is matter, this matter comes to 'exist' in a state of ever-changing receptivity, of chaotic malleability. This malleability is mirrored in and by the accrued 'personality' of the soul. When this personality is experienced as something more than a conduit between pure sense-perception and the act of judgment that makes the perception(s) intelligible, then the soul has fallen into forgetfulness. At this stage, the personality serves as a surrogate to the authentic existence provided by and through contemplation of the Soul.

4. Ethics

The highest attainment of the individual soul is, for Plotinus, "likeness to God as far as is possible" (I.2.1; cf. Plato, Theaetetus 176b). This likeness is achieved through the soul's intimate state of contemplation of its prior -- the Higher Soul -- which is, in fact, the individual soul in its own purified state. Now since the Soul does not come into direct contact with matter like the 'fragmented,' individual souls do, the purified soul will remain aloof from the disturbances of the realm of sense (pathos) and will no longer directly govern the cosmos, but leave the direct governance to those souls that still remain enmeshed in matter (cf. VI.9.7). The lower souls that descend too far into matter are those souls which experience most forcefully the dissimilative, negative affectivity of vivified matter. It is to these souls that the experience of Evil falls. For this reason, Plotinus was unable to develop a rigorous ethical system that would account for the responsibilities and moral codes of an individual living a life amidst the fluctuating realm of the senses. According to Plotinus, the soul that has descended too far into matter needs to "merely think on essential being" in order to become reunited with its higher part (IV.8.4). This seems to constitute Plotinus' answer to any ethical questions that may have been posed to him. In fact, Plotinus develops a radical stance vis-a-vis ethics, and the problem of human suffering. In keeping with his doctrine that the higher part of the soul remains wholly unaffected by the disturbances of the sense-realm, Plotinus declares that only the lower part of the soul suffers, is subject to passions, and vices, etc. In order to drive the point home, Plotinus makes use of a striking illustration. Invoking the ancient torture device known as the Bull of Phalaris (a hollow bronze bull in which a victim was placed; the bull was then heated until it became red hot), he tells us that only the lower part of the soul will feel the torture, while the higher part remains in repose, in contemplation (I.4.13). Although Plotinus does not explicitly say so, we may assume that the soul that has reunited with its higher part will not feel the torture at all. Since the higher part of the soul is (1) the source and true state of existence of all souls, (2) cannot be affected in any way by sensible affections, and (3) since the lower soul possesses of itself the ability to free itself from the bonds of matter, all particular questions concerning ethics and morality are subsumed, in Plotinus' system, by the single grand doctrine of the soul's essential imperturbability. The problems plaguing the lower soul are not, for Plotinus, serious issues for philosophy. His general attitude may be summed up by a remark made in the course of one of his discussions of 'Providence':

"A gang of lads, morally neglected, and in that respect inferior to the intermediate class, but in good physical training, attack and overthrow another set, trained neither physically nor morally, and make off with their food and their dainty clothes. What more is called for than a laugh?" (III.2.8, tr. MacKenna).

Of course, Plotinus was no anarchist, nor was he an advocate of violence or lawlessness. Rather, he was so concerned with the welfare and the ultimate salvation of each individual soul, that he elevated philosophy -- the highest pursuit of the soul -- to the level of a divine act, capable of purifying each and every soul of the tainting accruements of sensual existence. Plotinus' last words, recorded by Porphyry, more than adequately summarize the goal of his philosophy: "Strive to bring back the god in yourselves to the God in the All" (Life of Plotinus 2).

5. References and Further Reading

  • Elmer O'Brien, S. J. (1964) tr., The Essential Plotinus: Representative Treatises From The Enneads (Hackett Publishing).
    • This fine translation of the more accessible, if not always most relevant, treatises of Plotinus serves as a valuable introduction to the work of a difficult and often obscure thinker. The Introduction by O'Brien is invaluable.
  • Plotinus, The Enneads, tr. Stephen MacKenna, with Introduction and Notes by John Dillon (Penguin Books: 1991).
    • Stephen MacKenna's rightly famous translation of Plotinus is more interpretive than literal, and often less clear to a modern English reader than what is to be found in O'Brien's translation. However, before delving into the original Greek of Plotinus, one would do well to familiarize oneself with the poetic lines of MacKenna. The Penguin edition, although unfortunately abridged, contains an excellent Introduction by John Dillon, as well as a fine article by Paul Henry, S. J., "The Place of Plotinus in the History of Thought." Also included is MacKenna's translation of Porphyry's Life of Plotinus.
  • Plotinus, The Enneads, tr. A. H. Armstrong, including the Greek, in 7 volumes (Loeb Classical Library, Harvard-London: 1966-1968).
    • This is a readily available edition of Plotinus' Greek text. Armstrong's translation is quite literal, but for that reason, often less than helpful in rendering the subtleties of Plotinus' thought. For the reader who is ready to tackle Plotinus' difficult Greek, it is recommended that she make use of the Loeb edition in conjunction with the translations of O'Brien and MacKenna, relying only marginally on Armstrong for guidance.
  • Porphyry, Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind, tr. Kenneth Guthrie (Phanes Press: 1988). [A translation of Pros ta noeta aphorismoi]
    • This little introduction to Plotinus' philosophy by his most famous student is highly interesting, and quite valuable for an understanding of Plotinus' influence on later Platonists. However, as an accurate representation of Plotinus' thought, this treatise falls short. Porphyry often develops his own unique interpretations and arguments under the guise of a commentary on Plotinus. But that is as it should be. The greatest student is often the most violently original interpreter of his master's thought.
  • Frederick Copleston, S. J. A History of Philosophy: Volume 1, Greece and Rome, Part II (Image Books: 1962).
    • This history of philosophy is considered something of a classic in the field, and the section on Plotinus is well worth reading. However, Copleston's analysis of Plotinus' system represents the orthodox scholarly interpretation of Plotinus that has persisted up until the present day, with all its virtues and flaws. The account in the history book is no substitute for a careful study of Plotinus' text, although it does provide useful pointers for the beginner.
  • Kathleen Freeman, Ancilla to the Pre-Socratic Philosophers (Harvard University Press: 1970).
    • This is a complete English translation of the Fragments in Diels, Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, the standard edition of the surviving fragments of the Pre-Socratic philosophers. The study of these fragments, especially Parmenides, Heraclitus, Empedocles, and Anaxagoras, provides an essential background for the study of Plotinus.
  • Jacques Derrida, Speech and Phenomena, tr. David B. Allison (Northwestern University Press: 1973).
    • The essay "Form and Meaning: A Note on the Phenomenology of Language," in this edition, literally has Plotinus written all 'oeuvre' it.

To understand Plotinus in the fullest fashion, don't forget to familiarize yourself with Plato's Symposium, Phaedrus, Phaedo, the Republic, and the Letters (esp. II and VII), not to mention Aristotle, the Stoics and the Epicureans, the Hellenistic Astrologers, the Gnostics, the Hermetic Corpus, Philo and Origen.

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.

Minucius Felix (c. 2nd and 3rd cn. C.E.)

Minucius Felix was a Roman advocate, rhetorician, and Christian apologist. Like Lactantius, Minucius was a convert to Christianity. His only known work, the dialogue Octavius, is one of the earliest examples of Latin apologetics; it is an attack upon paganism and skepticism, and a defense of early Christianity as it was known in the Roman world. Minucius is of interest not only to theologians and Church historians, but also to those with an interest in philosophy and rhetoric. Unlike other Latin apologists of the period, such as Tertullian, who asserted credo quia ineptum (I believe because [it is] absurd) (De Carne Christi 5.4), and who was openly hostile to speculative philosophy, Minucius attempted to establish at least the rational possibility of the Christian faith. The rhetoric found within the Octavius can be considered Ciceronian, having elements of the six-part speech (exordium, narration, partition, confirmation, refutation, and conclusion). This text represents an important stage in the evolution of rhetoric from a primarily oral, forensic, and political art, to a literary art.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Circumstance
  2. The Dialogue
    1. Questions Concerning the Text
    2. The Debate
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Circumstance

Minucius lived in the late 2nd and early 3rd centuries C.E., although the exact dates of his birth and death are unknown. Most of what we know about him comes from his only surviving work, the Octavius. His first name is revealed as Marcus (III.1), and as a Roman advocate, he would "undertake the defense and protection of cases of sacrilege or incest or even murders" (XXVIII.3) within the basilica. He was once a pagan, and "after careful experience of either way of life," had "repudiated the one and approved of the other" (V.1).

Other sources for his life include Lactantius (240-320), the Professor of Latin Rhetoric at Nicomedia, who writes of Minucius, "among those who are known to me, Minucius Felix was not of mean repute among the case-pleaders of the place. His book, which has the title of Octavius, shows how suitable a defender of truth he could have been if he had devoted himself entirely to that pursuit" (Div. Inst. V.I). St. Jerome (342-420) mentions the Octavius briefly in the De Viris Illustribus and adds that Minucius also wrote a De fato (the fate), although this text has never been found. According to Jerome, Minucius practiced his profession in Rome (LVIII). Many historians assume that he was originally of African origin; his name is found on a dedication at Carthage, and on a column at Tebessa (DeLabriolle 110). However, other men shared his name, so it is unclear if these inscriptions actually refer to the author of the Octavius. In his dialogue, Minucius displays an antipathy towards the Roman policy of expansion: "all that the Romans hold, occupy, and possess is the spoil of outrage" (XXV.5), which may suggest he came to Rome from the provinces, but this could simply be a rhetorical commonplace. Curiously, there is no mention of Minucius in Eusebius' (260-340) History of the Church, although there are many passages in this tome regarding his contemporary Tertullian (c. 160-230).

From the dialogue, we can gather that Minucius was a highly educated man, with an intimate understanding of ancient authors such as Virgil, Ovid, Nepos, Thallus and Diodorus. His comments on these ancient authors allow historians to consider him a doxographer, or one who enumerates and comments upon texts from earlier periods. His rhetorical Latin is "grand" (gravis) and refined, and his descriptions vivid and compelling. He is careful to avoid slipping into the swollen or drifting style argued against in the Rhetorica ad Herrenium (see book IV). Aside from his religion, there is evidence from the dialogue that Minucius may have been a Stoic prior to his conversion. His passages on the "divine mind," or the intelligence behind all creation, attest to this (XIX.9-10) (see below).

The Octavius can be understood as an attack against the skepticism of the New Academy and of Pyrrhonism, and an attempt to reconcile nascent Christianity with Stoic philosophy and Roman civic life. But while Minucius rejects skepticism and embraces Stoicism, on first inspection he seems to adhere to the opinion of Tertullian;

What indeed has Athens to do with Jerusalem? What concord is there between the Academy and the Church? What between heretics and Christians? Our instruction comes from the "porch of Solomon" who had himself taught that "the Lord should be sought in simplicity of heart." Away with all attempts to produce a mottled Christianity of Stoic, Platonic, and dialectic composition! We want no curious disputation after possessing Christ Jesus, no inquisition after enjoying the Gospel (De praescriptione haereticorum 7).

In defending the intellect, Minucius is careful not to assert the primacy of philosophy, for that would be to declare reason above revelation. In this way, he is a member of what Etienne Gilson calls the "Tertullian Family"; he stresses the limitations of the intellect, but not the negation of it (History 48). The Octavius may have been intended to persuade intellectual Romans to reject both paganism and skepticism, and to embrace the new religion. Unlike Tertullian's dogmatic treatises, the dialogue is an elegant balancing act, careful to stress the fundamental precepts of Christianity, while expressing the practical and ethical value of Stoicism and criticizing the excesses of speculative philosophy. It has been said that Minucius Felix was the only Anti-Nicene father to present both the Christian and pagan side of the question (History 46).

2. The Dialogue

a. Questions Concerning the Text

Modern translations of the Octavius come from a 9th century manuscript in the Biblioteque Nationale in Paris which contains the seven books of Arnobius' (284-305) Adversus Nationes along with an 8th book—the Octavius. For centuries, scholars have attempted to assign a firm date of composition to the dialogue. The central question has always been, is the Octavius anterior to the Apologeticus of Tertullian? Stylistically, Minucius' Latin is closer to the classical Latin of Tacitus (54-117) than the excursive Latin of Tertullian, with its "complexity and strangeness" and "unnatural combinations of word and syntax" (Glover 12). Tertullian's Apologeticus displays a proliferation of compound-complex sentences, intervening phrases and clauses, and awkward constructions. Take for example XXXVIII.4: Aeque spectaculus vestris in tantum renuntiamus in quantum originibus eorum, quas scimus de superstitione conceptas, cum et ipsis rebus, de quibus transiguntur, praetersumus. (Your public games, we renounce too, as heartily as we do their origins; we know these origins lie in superstition; we leave on one side matters with which they are concerned). Minucius' style is generally more declarative and straightforward, and it is similar to other African writers of the period, such as Frontonius, Flaurus, and Apuleius (DeLabriolle 110).

Unlike the Apologeticus, which takes the form of a protest directed at the magistrates of the Roman Empire, the Octavius is a dialogue featuring individuals whom historians believe may have actually lived in the empire. This use of a dialogue is a Ciceronian technique (although certainly not exclusive to Cicero), and can be seen in De Oratore. Among Christian writers of the period, the dialogue form can also be seen in Ariston of Pella, Justin Martyr, and Caius of Rome (DeLabriolle 127). The Octavius is stylistically closer to the works of previous generations; it is markedly different than the texts written by Christian apologists in the 2nd and 3rd centuries. Nevertheless, the question of style is still debated among historians of Latin and scholars of early apologetics. Among the scholars that argue for the priority of the Octavius is O. Bardenhewer who writes, “It is Tertullian who made use of Minucius, and not Minucius who used the writings of Tertullian” (71).

A clue to the date of the dialogue may be found within Minucius' statement "if you think of earthly dominions, which surely have analogies to heaven. When has joint monarchy ever started in good faith, or ended without bloodshed?" (XVIII.6). This is perhaps a subtle allusion to the quarrel between the Antonine emperors Caracalla (188-217) and his brother Publius Septimius Geta (189-211), who ruled jointly before the Caracalla assassinated his brother in a fit of rage. The death of Geta was a shocking incident in the history of Rome, and it was surely on the mind of anyone writing during the period. Tertullian's Scorpiace written in 213 uses the allusion of Cain and Abel to illustrate the significance of this imperial fratricide. Minucius could not risk referring to the event directly, he had to instead use the illustration of the perils of joint rule as a rhetorical commonplace.

Perhaps the strongest argument for the priority of the Apologeticus can be found in Tertullian's assertion, "[I]f it comes to this that men who were called Romans are found to be enemies, why are we, who are thought to be enemies, denied the name of Romans?” (XXXVI.1). In 212, the Emperor Caracalla passed an edict known as the Constitutio Antoniniana, granting universal citizenship to all free Romans within the many provinces of the Empire. Prior to this, only men living within the Italian peninsula were considered citizens. Ostensibly, the edict's goal was to extend the benefits of citizenship to all qualified individuals, but it also had the effect of increasing tax revenues and military conscription. The edict is important in that while Tertullian complains of Christians lacking citizenship (at least those within the African provinces), Minucius ignores the issue altogether. Perhaps this is because the citizenship issue had already been settled by the time Minucius resolved to write his dialogue. So while the Octavius appears to be stylistically older than the Apologeticus, it is quite possible that it was composed no earlier than 212, following both the death of Geta, and the enactment of the Constitutio Antoniniana.

St. Cyprian's Quod idola non dii sint (that idols are not gods), written around 257-8, draws from the Octavius; an obvious parallel can be seen in chapter 9 of Cyprian's work in which the author declares, "this One cannot be seen, He is too bright to see; cannot be comprehended, He is too pure to grasp" (356), and in the Octavius, "God cannot be seen—he is too bright for sight; nor measured—for he is beyond all sense, infinite, measureless, his dimensions known to himself alone" (XVIII.7). A more telling approximation can be found in the passages of the idola in which Cyprian asserts that the gods of the Romans are merely deified men of antiquity, "Romulus was made a god when Proculus committed perjury" (351). And in a passage from the Octavius, Minucius writes,

It is a waste of time to go through all one by one, and to trace the whole family line; the mortality which we have proved in the case of their first parents has descended to the rest by order of succession. But perhaps you [Caecilius] imagine that men become gods after death; Romulus was made a god by the false oath of Proculus (XXI.9).

Since Lactantius mentions Minucius, and Cyprian used the Octavius as a source for the idola, the text must be no later than the middle of the 3rd century. Conversely, most scholars assume that the Apologeticus was composed in 197. Another possibility is that both the Octavius and the Apologeticus draw from an earlier text that has been lost, but this hypothesis has never been proven.

Some histories of rhetoric maintain that Minucius used the Apologeticus as a template, but the differences between the texts counterbalance the similarities. Tertullian's work can be classified under the blanket appellation literary rhetoric; his letters were usually intended for a single reader, oftentimes a Roman political leader such as Scapula (proconsul of Africa) or a theological adversary such as Praxeas. These works were not forensic exercises or speeches intended for large audiences; they were never intended to be performed. In the case of the Apologeticus we must consider that the advent of Christianity into the Roman Empire placed new obligations and prerogatives upon the rhetorician. As George Kennedy points out, "[e]xercises in declamation often lost touch with contemporary realities, a fact lamented by Quintilian, Tacitus, and others" (129). The new religion was one such "contemporary reality," and it required, for its defense the evolving art of apologetics, first seen in Justin Martyr's (100-165) Dialogue With Trypho the Jew. Nevertheless, apologetics depends greatly upon rhetoric, and Christians were obligated to learn the art, even though Tertullian forbade them from ever teaching it (On Idolatry 10).

So if we conclude that the texts are contra-distinct, the central question concerns the type or genre of oratory the Octavius represents. It is not an argument directed at a Roman official, or even a work intended to encourage persecuted Christians (exhortation). It contains elements of apologetics, yet retains more of a classical rhetorical structure; it stands somewhere between Cicero and Tertullian in form. Within the dialogue is a forensic debate in which Octavius Januarius defends his faith against the prosecutor Caecilius, with Minucius acting as arbiter. Arbesmann and others suggest that this debate is in the form of a controversia (317), a rhetorical exercise popular in the first century. In this exercise (described by Seneca the Elder), the instructor creates a special case for his students to build their arguments around. The teacher may posit a dilemma in which application of a particular law is difficult due to the circumstances involved; for instance, a woman who is raped has the choice of ordering the execution of her assailant or marrying him. But then it is discovered that the same man has raped two women in one night; one demands his death, the other asks him to marry her. For the Octavius to be a controversia it would have to be both fictional and hypothetical, however there is no evidence that it is either. Because there is a central issue (the "error" of paganism as opposed to the “truth” of Christian revelation), the dialogue can be considered an apology with a kind of scholastic dialectic which dictates its form, a pro et contra. All such dialectics have a deliberative character. Caecilius acts as the spokesman for the traditional Roman religion, and Octavius performs the same function for Christianity. The arguments follow and a conclusion is ultimately reached.

So while the text has forensic (judicial) characteristics, its genre can be considered deliberative in the Ciceronian sense, as the issue of expediency is central; should the honorable Roman continue to follow "the thick darkness of vulgar ignorance," risking a wreck upon "stones, however carved and anointed and garlanded they may be," i.e. the pagan tradition with its many eloquent champions, or should he turn to the "broad daylight" (II.1) of the new religion? The Octavius is an argument intended for Roman ears, not Christian, and as Cicero remarks, in any deliberative endeavor, the orator must know "the character of the community" (De Oratore II.337). As Gilson points out, Octavius avoids the "blunt dogmatism of Christian faith, something unpalatable to the cultured pagan mind" (46). This partially explains the curious absence of Christology within the text; the birth, death, and resurrection of Jesus are not mentioned. As DeLabriolle indicates, "amongst the apologists of the IInd century, Aristides, St. Justin and Tertullian are the only ones who have uttered the name of Jesus Christ" (117). Despite this, some have suggested that Minucius is somehow more orthodox than Tertullian, since the latter ultimately fell in with the Montanists (Forster 260). But his orthodoxy cannot be attested to, since he is intentionally vague on specific doctrinal matters. It would be counterproductive to swamp potential converts with the esoteric aspects of Christianity at the outset; Minucius instead presents and defends the exoteric image of the church. And while drawing heavily from ancient authors and historical events, Minucius never once uses scripture as an illustration of a point or concept.

b. The Debate

The dialogue opens with Minucius' recollections of his friendship to the recently deceased Octavius. The dead man was the "sole confident" of his affections, and his "partner in wanderings from the truth" (I.4-5). The language and circumstance is almost identical to that of Cicero in book 3 of De Oratore, as Cicero describes his "bitter recollection" that has "revived old feelings of distress and grief in [his] heart," (III.1-2) when he contemplates the death of fellow intellectual Lucius Crassus. In both instances, the occasion brings forth an opportunity to launch into a deliberative dialogue. As in Plato's Phaedrus, the debate takes place in the countryside, away from the noise and distraction of urban life. The setting is Ostia, a pleasant resort town less than twenty miles from Rome, known for its baths. Minucius, Octavius Januarius, and Caecilius have come to the resort to obtain "relief from judicial duties" (II.3). While walking along the shore, the men encounter an image of Serapsis, a Graeco-Egyptian god. Caecilius blows a kiss to the god, which is immediately followed by Octavius' chastisement of Minucius, that no man has the right to leave his friend in the "thick darkness of vulgar ignorance" (III.1). It is Octavius' position that any honorable Roman has the obligation to encourage his friends to accept the truth of Christianity.

An interesting section follows, in which the men proceed down the beach and see a group of boys skipping rocks in the ocean. It is a contest in which the boy who wins is the one whose shard travels the farthest out into the sea, and it is perhaps a metaphor for the power of argument within the contest of rhetoric. The scene awakens within Caecilius the desire to answer Octavius' indirect accusation. He suggests a debate in which Minucius is to act as arbiter, and as a guarantee of Minucius' impartiality, Caecilius commands him to "take your seat as a novice, ignorant as it were of either side of the case" (V.1-2).

Caecilius' prooemium is direct and forthright; he believes he is defending that which is honorable (not only the Roman religion, but the philosophy of Skepticism), and makes no attempt at winning the audience's favor. This is consistent with book one of the Rhetorica ad Herrenium, in which a direct opening (prooemium) should be used instead of a subtle opening (ephodos) if the speaker’s (or writer’s) cause is honorable and his position confident (I.IV.5-8). A closer analysis of his opening reveals that his Latin is "rounded," as the critical concept (informandus est animus) is carried structurally in the middle, and subordinate ideas are handled with adversative, causal, and relative clauses (O'Connor 167). It is a stylistic pattern that will be repeated throughout his speech. Caecilius declares that everyone "must feel indignant and annoyed that certain persons—persons untrained in study, uninitiated in letters ... should come to fixed conclusions upon the universe" (V.4). The ad hominem charge that Christians, traditionally members of the Roman lower classes, and with little education, are in no position to assert their position on theological matters is not original; it can be seen in Tertullian's Apologeticus as well. Caecilius follows this with the statement: Sufficient be it for our happiness, and sufficient for our wisdom if, according to the ancient oracle of the wise men, we learn closer acquaintance with our own selves. But seeing that with mad and fruitless toil we overstep the limits of our humble intelligence, and from our earth-bound level seek, with audacious eagerness, to scale heaven itself and the stars of heaven, let us at least not aggravate our error by vain and terrifying imaginations (V.5-6).

This passage is important on a number of levels: the reference to the Oracle of Delphi and the ancient maxim “know thyself,” display Caecilius' sympathy for the "New Academy," the movement of Platonic philosophy into the regions of skepticism. This also sounds very similar to the passage in De Natura Deorum, "[a]nd until this issue is decided, mankind must continue to labor under the profoundest uncertainty, and to be in ignorance about matters of the highest moment" (I.3).

Caecilius continues his speech with a particularly poetic and vivid illustration of the fortuitous and capricious nature of the physical world; natural disasters destroy the innocent as well as the guilty, and the harvest is obliterated by violent squalls and suffocating droughts. If divine intelligence and wisdom ruled the world, we would not see so much injustice in the human realm. Camillus would not have been sent into exile, Socrates would never have been forced to drink hemlock, and the tyrants Phalaris and Dionysius "would never have deserved a throne" (V.12). The proposition or partitio is then introduced, "[C]um igitur aut fortuna caeca aut incerta natura sit", and the Latin here is a little unclear; it should probably read, "[S]eeing then that either blind fortune or uncertain nature" are the two possibilities open to us, we should "accept the teaching of our elders as the priest of truth" (VI.1). Caecilius feels "since everything evades man's grasp, he ought to cling with all the more tenacious energy to those fixed points which are open to him" (DeLabriolle 112). The Romans can judge their efforts at piety simply by the results given to them: Rome has enjoyed hundreds of years of prosperity and expansion under the pagan gods, even as it has absorbed other religions and deities from people like the Gauls, Syrians, and Taurians. Military leaders have seen their successes and failures depend upon the favor of the gods; Brennus was defeated at the river Allia in 390 B.C. because of his "contempt for the auspices" (VII.4). Marcus Crassus dared to attack the Parthians after ignoring the imprecations of the Furies (VIII.5), and was summarily routed. Even those that have claimed the supremacy of their god over the Roman pantheon, the Jews for instance, have ended up in captivity to Rome. As Gilson remarks, "had not these gods led to world leadership? No doctrine could be certain enough to justify national apostasy" (History 46). Within this section, Caecilius uses rhetorical techniques such as preterition and paralipsis to emphasize that he argues from common sense and communal knowledge; “[M]ulta praetereo consulto” (Much I purposely pass over) (X.1), “[s]ed omitto communia (things however common to all I pass over) (XII.2), and finally, “[m]ulta ad haec subpetunt, ni festinat oratio” (much might be added on this subject) (XI.5).

Caecilius then turns his attention towards specific tenets of the Christian religion. What if the body has gone to pieces? Will it be resurrected this way? When Christians suffer in pyres or on crosses, why does their god refuse to help them? Their god cannot attend to particulars because he is preoccupied with the whole, and cannot attend to the whole because he is preoccupied with particulars (X.5). If the Christians dare to philosophize, they would do well to follow the maxim of Socrates, "that which is above us does not concern us," an attitude from which "flowed the guarded skepticism of Arcesilas, and later of Carneades" (XIII.1-3). Arcesilas was one of the first philosophers to teach the suspension of judgment (epokhé) that leads to ataraxía (freedom from worry). This philosophy would be expanded by Sextus Empiricus in the late 3rd century in his Outlines of Pyrrhonism (see below).

In his conclusion, Caecilius returns to the central argument of his speech, that "things that are doubtful, as they are, should be left in doubt" (XIV.5). DeLabriolle describes Caecilius as " an admirable representative of those lettered pagans who were very skeptical as regards the foundation of things, but who from civic pietas and from respect for the mos majorum, thought it their duty to energetically defend the religion of tradition" (113). When Caecilius begins to brag and insult Octavius, Minucius intervenes and tells him it is truth (veritati), not glory (laudi) they are striving for (XIV.3). This is further evidence of the deliberative nature of the dialogue; it is not a forensic contest or a flowery debate, but a search for truth. In any debate, one can dazzle an audience with a virtuosic display and thus win honors for himself, and some have argued that this became the principle interest of orators during the Imperial age (Dunn 4). But Minucius obviously expects more from rhetoric. He furthers his criticism of the art by saying, "an audience, as everyone knows , is so easily swayed. Fascination of words distracts them from attention to facts ... forgetting that the incredible contains an element of truth, and probability an element of falsehood" (XIV.4). This at once sets the stage for a new philosophy, one that eschews Skepticism, and it serves as a transition and introduction to the speech of Octavius. It is he who will stress the incredible as true.

After declaring the need to take the verity of all arguments into consideration, Minucius then moves beyond criticism of rhetoric to comment on Skepticism directly, "[a]ccordingly we must take good care not to become victims of a dislike of all arguments whatsoever" (XIV). We cannot take the position of the Pyrrhonists and say:

while the dogmatizer posits the matter of his dogma as substantial truth, the skeptic enunciates his formulae so that they are virtually cancelled by themselves, he should not be said to dogmatize his enunciation of them. And most important of all, in his enunciation of these formulae he states what appears to himself and announces his own impression in an undogmatic way, without making any positive assertion regarding the external realities (Outlines 14-15).

According to the Pyrrhonists, only the dogmatist asserts the absolute "truth" of any given proposition, the skeptic merely enunciates what he sees. Minucius feels that to abstain from asserting anything either positive or negative is to display a contempt for argument, and therefore a contempt for truth. One who does not believe in truth cannot take revelation seriously, and this attitude thus undermines the very foundations of Christianity. But this goes beyond religion, as Sextus Empiricus includes the Epicureans and Stoics among the "dogmatists" he rejects (3). If we accept that Pyrrhonism represents the evolution of Skepticism from the New Academy of Carneades (214-129 B.C.) to a new "Roman" equivalent, in that they find a common bond in the primacy of akatalêpsia (also see Hakinson 50) and ataraxía, we can see the underlying conflict in the Octavius transcends religious issues. How can the Roman advocate argue from a position of logos (reason) if everything is uncertain? How can the Stoic or Epicurean extol the virtues of his philosophy if equally persuasive arguments exist to the contrary? How can anyone be certain that what he or she learns is of value?

Caecilius immediately objects to Minucius' interference, accusing him of attempting to "break the force of [his] pleading by interpolating this weighty subject for debate; it is for Octavius to deal with my several points" (XV.1). Octavius finally responds with his exordium, by doing two things: to speak of himself to win the audience's sympathy, and to speak of his adversary. He requests the assistance of the audience to "turn the floodgates of truth upon the stains of blackening calumny" (XVI.1). As in an enthymeme, the orator must supply the necessary premises and the audience must reach the intended conclusion. According to Octavius, Caecilius is a man "who does not know the right way, when the road happens to fork off in several directions; and not knowing the way, he doubts and hesitates" (XVI.3). Such a man does not know the implications of such a vacillating world-view. He accuses Caecilius of declaring that the gods cannot be said to exist one moment, and then insisting that they must be worshipped the next.

Octavius then offers his own partitio, "I will refute and disprove his inconsistent arguments by proving and establishing a single truth; setting him free from all further occasion for doubt and wandering" (XVI.4). What follows is a direct appeal to the Roman ideal of expediency and practical wisdom in the form of an argument by analogy, "without careful investigation of the nature of deity, you cannot know that of man; just as you cannot manage the civic affairs successfully without some knowledge of the wider world-society of men" (XVII.2). There is a relationship between theology and humanity, a relationship that must be understood by anyone attempting wise governance of mankind.

The first point Octavius tackles is that of intelligent design, or the divine intention behind creation. The regularity in the motion of the heavens, the waxing and waning moon, the blooming of flowers, all of these things attest to God's involvement in nature. There is a similar passage in Cicero’s De Natura Deorum:

There are however other philosophers, and those of eminence and note, who believe that the whole world is ruled and governed by divine intelligence and reason ... the weather and the seasons and the changes of the atmosphere by which all products of the soil are ripened and matured are the gift of the immortal gods to the human race (I.4-5).

But of greater importance, is Cicero's adumbration that Carneades argued against this position persuasively, and this brings us back to the argument between Caecilius and Octavius.

Octavius proceeds from an enumeration of the products of the divine intelligence to the nature of God himself. His statements "God cannot be seen—he is too bright for sight; nor measured—for he is beyond all sense, infinite, measureless, his dimensions known to himself alone" (XVIII.7), and "the majesty of God is the despair of the understanding" (XIX.14) foreshadow negative theology of the Arians and Cappadocians. Gregory of Nyssa (d.385), for instance, claimed that because time implies measurement, God is therefore “out of time ... and the deity is of course incommensurable” (Mortley 129). This via negativa (negative way) would later find its fullest expression in the works of 5th century theologian Dionysius the Pseudo-Areopagite. Octavius' admonition "[S]eek not a name for God: God is his name. Terms are needed when individuals have to be distinguished from the mass" (XVIII.10), may find some foundation in certain passages of scripture, such as Exodus 3:14, in which God says to Moses "I am who am," and Malachi 3:6, "I the Lord change not," but there are no direct examples of Minucius’ exegesis, so this is only speculation. In his Against Eunomius Gregory takes up the issue of “names” for God. When the theologian says, “God is good,” or “God is immutable,” he introduces a copula between God and another term (Pr.). This “isness of God remains undescribed. The ‘is’ of the copula refers to the being of God, and this is actually undefinable” (Mortley 180). To bolster his argument that God is infinite (and ultimately unknowable in a human sense), Minucius offers the supporting opinions of Xenophanes (who held God to be infinite) and Aristotle (who assigns a single power of intelligence behind creation).

Upon establishing his confirmatio, Minucius then moves into the refutatio. The gods and religious traditions of the Romans are products of an "ignorant tradition, charmed or captivated by its pet fables" (XX.2). And in an amazing bit of inconsistency, asks "[w]hy recall old wives' tales of human beings changed into birds and beasts, or into trees and flowers? Had such things happened in the past, they would happen now; as they cannot happen now, they did not happen then" (XX.4). Such an argument could easily be used against the Christians.

As to the argument of collective wisdom, Octavius dismisses it as "[g]eneral insanity shield[ing] itself behind the multitude of the insane" (XXIII.10), an insanity promoted by the "fatal influence" of poets. It was right for Plato to exclude Homer from the ideal Republic, for "he above all others in his Iliad, though half in jest, gave gods a place in the affairs and doings of men" (XXIV.2-4). The Romans are vain in thinking such incestuous and fictitious beings somehow hold dominion over the affairs of humanity. And In the next section, Octavius counters Caecilius' argument that the Christian god is oblivious to the suffering of his subjects. The success of the Jews depended upon their fidelity to the one God; when they deserted Him, they fell into captivity and misery. "That those who know not God deserve their tortures, as impious and unrighteous, none but an atheist doubts" (XXXV.4). And if one dares to say the Christians are a miserable lot, Octavius counters that they would prefer to despise wealth than hoard it, turning to the maxim: "[a]s on the highroad he who walks lightest walks with most ease" (XXXVI.6). The Stoic suffering of the persecuted Christians is evidence of their collective conviction that paradise awaits them following death. And in death, everyone is equal; "[a]re you of noble lineage? Proud of your ancestry? yet we are all born equal; virtue alone gives mark." What good is it "to shine in purple and be squalid in mind" (XXXVII.10-11). The parallels between this attitude and Stoic philosophy are obvious. As the Emperor Marcus Aurelius (121-180) said in book II of his Meditations, "do the things external which fall upon thee distract thee?"

Octavius closes with a final attack on the philosophers he despises:

Let Socrates look to himself! Socrates, "the buffoon of Athens" (as Zeno called him), who confessed he knew nothing, though he boasted of the promptings of a deceiving demon; Arcesilas too, and Carneades, and Pyrrho, and even the whole host of the Academics, let them argue on! (XXXVIII.5-6).

This passage is as important for the names Octavius leaves off the list, as the names he puts on it. According to Octavius, Skepticism is the bastard child of Socrates, a child that has been nurtured by the New Academy, and is even now asserting its pernicious influence over Roman life. The Christians reject the attitude of these "high-brow" philosophers, as the faithful "do not preach great things, but we live by them" (XXXVIII.6). Philosophy is an idle and vain pursuit if it does not include the truth that comes from revelation, an idea that would characterize many of Tertullian's theological disputations.

In his final comments, Octavius borrows a page from Caecilius' handbook, and uses the first person plural to adopt a conciliatory tone, "Fruamur bono nostro et recti sententiam temperemus" (let us enjoy our good things, coordinate our sense of right) (XXXVIII.7).

Upon completion of the second speech, Caecilius declares Octavius to be the winner, but also claims a victory for himself, in that he has had his triumph over error. He understands the main issue to be one of providence, the same issue that is central to book one of Cicero's De Natura Deorum. The skeptic denies providence, and therefore cannot enjoy the fullness of truth (alétheia).

3. Conclusion

The Octavius stands apart from Tertullian's Apologeticus in that it is less dogmatic, more consistent with Roman sensibilities, and more eloquently expresses the difficult philosophical problems of the day. Gilson astutely points out, "Tertullian seems to have completely forgotten what reasons he had once had to be pagan. This is something which Minucius has never forgotten" (History 46). The dialogue illustrates many of the problems nascent Christianity faced during the Imperial era. Long before St. Augustine of Hippo (354-430) reconciled his faith with Neo-Platonism, the Latin fathers struggled with defining the boundaries between reason and revelation; Skepticism was always dangerously lurking in the corner. Minucius' view is clear when he exclaims, "he [Octavius] disarmed ill-will by the very weapons which the philosophers use for their attack, and had set forth truth in a guise at once so easy and so attractive" (XXXIX.7). Rhetoric and logic are not to be discarded when defending the faith, but one must be careful not to assert the sovereignty of these worldly arts over the sublime truths of revelation.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Bardenhewer, Otto. Patrologie. Freiberg: Herder, 1901.
  • Barnes, Timothy David. Tertullian: A Historical and Literary Study. Oxford: Clarendon, 1971.
  • Boyes-Stones, G.R. Post-Hellenistic Philosophy: A Study of its Development From the Stoics to Origen. New York: Oxford, 2001.
  • Cicero, Marcus Tullius. De Natura Deorum & Academica. Trans. H. Rackham. London: Putnam, 1932.
  • Cicero, Marcus Tullius. De Inventione, De Optimo Genere Oratorum, Topica. Trans. H.M. Hubbell. London: William Heinemann LTD, 1968.
  • Cyprianus, Thascius Caecilius. Treatises. Trans. Roy J. Deferrari. New York: Catholic University Press, 1958.
  • DeLabriolle, Pierre. History of Literature of Christianity From Tertullian to Boethius. London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co., 1924.
  • Dunn, Geoffrey D. "Rhetorical Structure in Tertullian's Ad Scaplam." Vigilae Christiannae 56 (2002): 47-55.
  • Dunn, Geoffrey D. "Rhetoric and Tertullian's De Virginibus Velandis." Vigilae Christiannae 59 (2005): 1-30.
  • Empiricus, Sextus. Outlines of Pyrrhonism. Trans. R.G. Bury. New York: Promethius, 1990.
  • Eusebius. History of the Church From Christ to Constantine. Trans. G.A. Williamson. New York: Dorset, 1984.
  • Felix, Minucius. Octavius. Trans. Gerald H. Rendall. Cambridge: Harvard University, 2003.
  • Felix, Minucius. Octavius. Trans. Arbesmann, Rudolph. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University Press, 1962.
  • Forster, Roger, & Paul Marston. Reason & Faith. Eastbourne: Monarch Publications, 1980.
  • Gilson, Etienne. History of Christian Philosophy in the Middle Ages. London: Sheed & Ward, 1955.
  • Gilson, Etienne. Reason and Revelation in the Middles Ages. New York: Scribners, 1938.
  • Glover, T.R. Life and Letters in the Fourth Century. New York: Russell, 1968.
  • Hackinson, R.J. "Values, Objectivity, and Dialectic; The Skeptical Attack on Ethics: Its Methods, Aims, and Success." Phronesis 39 (1993): 45-68.
  • Kennedy, George. Classical Rhetoric and Its Christian and Secular Tradition From Ancient to Modern Times. Chapel Hill: North Carolina, 1999.
  • Lactantius. The Divine Institutes. Trans. Sister Mary Francis McDonald. Washington D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 1964.
  • Marias, Julian. Philosophy as Dramatic Theory. University Park: Penn State, 1971.
  • Mortley, Raoul. From Word to Silence: The Rise and Fall of Logos. Hanstein: Bonn, 1986.
  • O'Connor, Joseph. "The Conflict of Rhetoric in the 'Octavius' of Minucius Felix." Classical Folia 30 (1976): 165-173.
  • Quintilian, Marcus Fabius. Institutio Oratorio. Trans. John Selby. Carbondale: Southern Illinois, 1987.
  • Tertullian, Septimius Florentis. Apologeticus & De Spectaculus. Trans. T.R. Glover. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2003.
  • Tertullian, Septimius Florentis. Adversus Praxean Liber. London: University of Edinburgh, 1948.
  • Tertullian, Septimius Florentis. The Writings of Tertullian II: Ante Nicene Christian Library Translations of the Writings of the Fathers Down to AD 325. Trans. Alexander Roberts.

Author Information

C. Francis Higgins
University of Louisiana Lafayette
U. S. A.

Anaxagoras (c. 500—428 B.C.E.)

AnaxagorasAnaxagoras of Clazomenae was an important Presocratic natural philosopher and scientist who lived and taught in Athens for approximately thirty years. He gained notoriety for his materialistic views, particularly his contention that the sun was a fiery rock. This led to charges of impiety, and he was sentenced to death by the Athenian court. He avoided this penalty by leaving Athens, and he spent his remaining years in exile. While Anaxagoras proposed theories on a variety of subjects, he is most noted for two theories. First, he speculated that in the physical world everything contains a portion of everything else. His observation of how nutrition works in animals led him to conclude that in order for the food an animal eats to turn into bone, hair, flesh, and so forth, it must already contain all of those constituents within it. The second theory of significance is Anaxagoras’ postulation of Mind (Nous) as the initiating and governing principle of the cosmos.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Writing
  2. The Structure of Things: A Portion of Everything in Everything
    1. The Challenge of Parmenides
    2. Empedocles’s Theory
    3. The Lesson of Nutrition
    4. The Divisibility of “Stuffs”
    5. Why is Something What It Is?
  3. The Origins of the Cosmos
  4. Mind (nous)
    1. The Role of Mind
    2. The Nature of Mind
  5. Other Theories
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Writing

The exact chronology of Anaxagoras is unknown, but most accounts place his dates around 500-428 BCE. Some have argued for dates of c. 534-467 BCE, but the 500-428 time period is the most commonly accepted among scholars. Anaxagoras was born in Ionia in the town of Clazomenae, a lively port city on the coast of present-day Turkey. As such, he is considered to be both the geographical and theoretical successor to the earliest Ionian philosophers, particularly Anaximenes. Eventually, Anaxagoras made his way to Athens and he is often credited with making her the home of Western philosophical and physical speculation. Anaxagoras remained in Athens for some thirty years, according to most accounts, until he was indicted on the charge of impiety and sentenced to death. Rather than endure this penalty, Anaxagoras, with the help of his close friend and student, Pericles, went to Lampsacus, in Asia Minor, where he lived until his death.

Anaxagoras’ trial and sentencing in Athens were motivated by a combination of political and religious concerns. His close association with Pericles left him vulnerable to those who wished to discredit the powerful and controversial student through the teacher. Furthermore, his materialistic beliefs and teachings were quite contrary to the standard orthodoxy of the time, particularly his view that the heavenly bodies were fiery masses of rock whirling around the earth in ether. Such convictions are famously attested to inPlato’s Apology when Socrates, accused by Meletus of believing that the sun is stone and the moon is earth, distances himself from such atheistic notions:

My dear Meletus, do you think you are prosecuting Anaxagoras? Are you so contemptuous of the jury and think them so ignorant of letters as not to know that the books of Anaxagoras of Clazomenae are full of those theories, and further, that the young men learn from me what they can buy from time to time for a drachma, at most, in the bookshops, and ridicule Socrates if he pretends that these theories are his own, especially as they are so absurd? (26d)

As with the dates of his birth and death, the chronology of Anaxagoras’ exile and subsequent time in Lampsacus are a bit of a mystery. Some of the historical testimonies indicate that his trial occurred shortly before the Peloponnesian War, around 431 BCE. If this is the case, then Anaxagoras’ time in exile would have lasted no more than a few years. Other records indicate that his trial and exile occurred much earlier, and his time in Lampsacus enabled him to start an influential school where he taught for nearly twenty years. With regard to the persona of Anaxagoras, there are quite a few interesting anecdotes that paint a picture of an ivory tower scientist and philosopher who was extremely detached from the general concerns and practical matters of life. While the stories are possibly fanciful, the consistent image of Anaxagoras presented throughout antiquity is that of a person entirely consumed by the pursuit of knowledge. In fact, he apparently maintained that the opportunity to study the universe was the fundamental reason why it is better to be born than to not exist.

In his Lives of the PhilosophersDiogenes Laertius states that Anaxagoras is among those philosophers who wrote only one book. This work was a treatise on natural philosophy and, as the above quote from the Apology indicates, it was probably not a very long work, since it could be purchased for “a drachma, at most.” Although the book has not survived, it was available until at least the sixth-century CE. While it is impossible to recreate the entire content and order of his work, various ancient sources have provided scholars with enough information to fairly represent Anaxagoras’ philosophy. Noteworthy among these sources are AristotleTheophrastus (ca. 372-288 BCE) and Themistius (ca. 317-387 CE). We are primarily indebted, however, to Simplicius (sixth-century CE) for most of our knowledge of, and access to, the fragments of Anaxagoras’ work. Before moving on to the theories of Anaxagoras, it should be noted that there are some rather wide ranging disagreements among scholars today about some of the basic tenets of his philosophy. In fact, within the past twenty years or so, there have been a greater variety of interpretations of Anaxagoras than perhaps any other Presocratic philosopher.

2. The Structure of Things: A Portion of Everything in Everything

Anaxagoras’ innovative theory of physical nature is encapsulated in the phrase, “a portion of everything in everything.” Its primary expression is found in the following difficult fragment:

And since the portions of both the large and the small are equal in amount, in this way too all things would be in everything; nor can they be separate, but all things have a portion of everything. Since there cannot be a smallest, nothing can be separated or come to be by itself, but as in the beginning now too all things are together. But in all things there are many things, equal in amount, both in the larger and the smaller of the things being separated off. (frag. 6)

It should be pointed out that it is rather difficult to determine what exactly Anaxagoras meant by “things.” It is tempting to view this as a theory of matter, but this would be misguided as it tends to apply later Aristotelian categories and interpretations onto Anaxagoras. At times, the term “seeds” has been utilized but it would seem that many scholars today prefer the neutral term “stuffs” to depict this notion. In any case, this rather complex theory is best understood as Anaxagoras’ attempt to reconcile his perceptions of the world with an influential argument (presented some time earlier by Parmenides) about how reality must be conceived.

a. The Challenge of Parmenides

According to Parmenides, whatever is, is (being) and whatever is not, is not (nonbeing). As a result, whatever constitutes the nature of reality must always “have been” since nothing can come into being from nothing. Furthermore, reality must always “be” since being (what is) cannot become nonbeing (what is not). This argument led Parmenides to a monistic and static conception of reality. As such, the world of changing particulars is deceptive, despite appearances to the contrary. Anaxagoras appears to accept this argument of Parmenides as the following statement indicates: “The Greeks are wrong to accept coming to be and perishing, for no thing comes to be, nor does it perish.” (frag. 17) Anaxagoras could not, however, square the thesis of radical monism with his experience of a world that seems to admit plurality and change. In fact, if all of the theses of Parmenides are correct, there is no possibility of science because all empirically gathered data is misleading. Therefore, the challenge for Anaxagoras and other post-Parmenidian philosophers was to present a proper account of nature while maintaining the demand that the stuff that constitutes reality can neither come into being from nothing nor pass away into nonbeing.

b. Empedocles’s Theory

Empedocles was a contemporary of Anaxagoras and, while the historical records are inconclusive, it is possible that the latter was partially reacting to the theory of the former in the development of his own views. In response to Parmenides, Empedocles maintained that the four elements—earth, air, fire, water—were the constituents or “roots” of all matter. These four roots cannot come into being, be destroyed or admit any change. Therefore, apart from the fact that there are four, they are essentially identical to the “one” of Parmenides. The roots mix together in various proportions to account for all the things in the world that we suppose to be real, such as apples, horses, etc. As an apple dissolves, it does not collapse into nonbeing, rather the mixture that has accounted for the apparent apple of our senses has simply been rearranged. Apples, and other “mortal things,” as Empedocles called them, do not actually come to be, nor are they actually destroyed. This is simply the way humans like to talk about entities which appear to exist but do not.

Anaxagoras’ relationship to Empedocles is difficult to discern, but it is possible that he was not satisfied with Empedocles’ response to Parmenides and the Eliatics. On Aristotle’s interpretation, Anaxagoras maintained that the pluralism of Empedocles unduly singled out certain substances as primary and others as secondary. According to Anaxagoras, the testimony of our senses maintains that hair or flesh exist as assuredly as earth, air, water or fire. In fact, all of the infinite numbers of substances are as real as the root substances. Therefore, under this interpretation the key problem for Anaxagoras is that under Empodocles' theory it would be possible to divide a hair into smaller and smaller pieces until it was no longer hair, but a composite of the root substances. As such, this would no longer satisfy the requirement that a definite substance cannot pass into nonbeing. According to other interpretations, however, some of the textual evidence from Anaxagoras seems to suggest that he treated some “things” (ala Empedocles) as more basic and primary than others. In any case, the theoretical distinctions between the two philosophers are somewhat unclear. Despite these difficulties, it is clear that Anaxagoras proposes a theory of things that is distinct from Empedocles while encountering the challenges of Parmenides.

c. The Lesson of Nutrition

While there is some recent scholarly debate about this, Anaxagoras’ contention that all things have a portion of everything may have had its genesis in the phenomenon of nutrition. He observed among animals that the food that is used to nourish develops into flesh, hair, etc. For this to be the case, Anaxagoras believed that rice, for instance, must contain within it the substances hair and flesh. Again, this is in keeping with the notion that definite substances cannot arise from nothing: “For how can hair come to be from not hair or flesh from not flesh?” (frag. 10). Moreover, not only does a piece of rice contain hair and flesh, it in fact contains the entirety of all the infinite amount of stuffs (a portion of everything). But how is this possible?

d. The Divisibility of “Stuffs”

To understand how it is possible for there to be a portion of everything in everything, it is necessary to develop Anaxagoras’ contention that stuff is infinitely divisible. In practical terms, this can be explained by continuing with the example of the rice kernel. For Anaxagoras, if one were to begin dividing it into smaller and smaller portions there would be no point at which the rice would no longer exist. Each infinitesimally small piece could be divided into another, and each piece would continue to contain rice, as well as hair, flesh and a portion of everything else. Prior to Anaxagoras, Zeno, a disciple of Parmenides, argued against the notion that matter could be divided at all, let alone infinitely. Apparently, Zeno had about forty reductio ad absurdum attacks on pluralism, four of which are known to us. For our purposes, it is not necessary to delve into these arguments, but a key assumption that arises from Zeno is the contention that a plurality of things would make the notion of magnitude meaningless. For Zeno, if an infinite division of things were possible then the following paradox would arise. The divisions would conceivably be so small that they would have no magnitude at all. At the same time, things would have to be considered infinitely large in order to be able to be infinitely divided. While the scholarly evidence is not conclusive, it seems quite possible that Anaxagoras was replying to Zeno as he developed his notion of infinite divisibility.

As the following fragment indicates, Anaxagoras did not consider the consequence that Zeno presented to be problematic: “For of the small there is no smallest, but always a smaller (for what is cannot not be). But also of the large there is always a larger, and it is equal in amount to the small. But in relation to itself, each is both large and small” (frag. 3). According to some interpreters, what is remarkable about this fragment, and others similar to it, is that it indicates the extent to which Anaxagoras grasped the notion of infinity. As W.K.C. Guthrie points out, “Anaxagoras’ reply shows an understanding of the meaning of infinity which no Greek before him had attained: things are indeed infinite in quantity and at the same time infinitely small, but they can go on becoming smaller to infinity without thereby becoming mere points without magnitude” (289). Other interpretations are somewhat less charitable toward Anaxagoras’ grasp of infinity, however, and point out that he may not have been conceptualizing about the notion of mathematical infinity when speaking about divisibility.

In any case, as strange as it may appear to modern eyes, Anaxagoras’ unique and subtle theory accomplished what it set out to do. It satisfied the Parmenidian demand that nothing can come into or out of being and it accounted for the plurality and change that constitutes our world of experience. A difficult question remains for Anaxagoras’ theory, however.

e. Why is Something What It Is?

If, according to Anaxagoras, everything contains a portion of everything, then what makes something (rice, for instance) what it is? Anaxagoras does not provide a clear response to this question, but an answer is alluded to in his claim that “each single thing is and was most plainly those things of which it contains most.” (frag. 12) Presumably, this can be taken to mean that each constituent of matter also has a part of matter that is predominant in it. Commentators from Aristotle onward have struggled to make sense of this notion, but it is perhaps Guthrie’s interpretation that is most helpful: “Everything contains a portion of everything else, and a large piece of something contains as many portions as a small piece of it, though they differ in size; but every substance does not contain all the infinite number of substances in equal proportions” (291). As such, a substance like rice, while containing everything, contains a higher proportion of white, hardness, etc. than a substance like wood. Simply stated, rice contains more stuff that makes it rice than wood or any other substance. Presumably, rice also contains higher proportions of flesh and hair than wood does. This would explain why, from Anaxagoras’ perspective, an animal can become nourished by rice by not by wood.

Anaxagoras’ theory of nature is quite innovative and complex, but unfortunately his fragments do not provide us with very many details as to how things work on a micro level. He does, however, provide us with a macro level explanation for the origins of the world as we experience it. It is to his cosmogony that we now turn our attention.

3. The Origins of the Cosmos

Anaxagoras’ theory of the origins of the world is reminiscent of the cosmogonies that had been previously developed in the Ionion tradition, particularly through Anaximenes and Anaximander. The traditional theories generally depict an original unity which begins to become separated off into a series of opposites. Anaxagoras maintained many of the key elements of these theories, however he also updated these cosmogonies, most notably through the introduction of a causal agent (Mind or nous) that is the initiator of the origination process.

Prior to the beginning of world as we know it everything was combined together in such a unified manner that there were no qualities or individual substances that could be discerned. “All things were together, unlimited in both amount and smallness.” (frag. 1) As such, reality was like the Parmenidian whole, except this whole contained all the primary matters or “seeds,” which are represented in the following passages through a series of opposites:

But before these things separated off, when [or, since] all things were together, not even any color was manifest, for the mixture of all things prevented it—the wet and the dry, the hot and the cold, the bright and the dark, there being also much earth in the mixture and seeds unlimited in amount, in no way like one another. For none of the other things are alike either, the one to the other. Since this is so, it is necessary to suppose that all things were in the whole. (frag. 4b) The things in the single cosmos are not separate from one another, nor are they split apart with an axe, either the hot from the cold or the cold from the hot (frag. 8).

At some point, the unity is spurred into a vortex motion at a force and a speed “of nothing now found among humans, but altogether many times as fast” (frag. 9). This motion begins the separation and it is “air and aither” that are the first constituents of matter to become distinct. Again, this is not to be seen in Empedoclean terms to indicate that air and ether are primary elements They are simply a part of the infinite constituents of matter represented by the phrase “mixture and seeds.” As the air and ether became separated off, all other elements become manifest in this mixture as well: “From these things as they are being separated off, earth is being compounded; for water is being separated off out of the clouds, earth out of water, and out of the earthy stones are being compounded by the cold, and these [i.e., stones] move further out than the water” (frag. 16).

Therefore, the origin of the world is depicted through this process of motion and separation from the unified mixture. As mentioned above, in answering the “how” of cosmogony, Anaxagoras is fairly traditional in his theory. In proposing an initiator or causal explanation for the origins of the process, however, Anaxagoras separates himself from his predecessors.

4. Mind (nous)

a. The Role of Mind

According to Anaxagoras, the agent responsible for the rotation and separation of the primordial mixture is Mind or nous: “And when Mind began to cause motion, separating off proceeded to occur from all that was moved, and all that Mind moved was separated apart, and as things were being moved and separated apart, the rotation caused much more separating apart to occur” (fr. 13). As is previously mentioned, it is rather significant that Anaxagoras postulates an explanation for the movement of the cosmos, something that prior cosmogonies did not provide. But how is this explanation to be understood? From the passage above, one may infer that Mind serves simply as the initial cause for the motion, and once the rotation is occurring, the momentum sets everything else into place. In this instance it is tempting to assign a rather deistic function to Mind. In other passages, however, Mind is depicted as “ruling” the rotation and setting everything in order as well as having supreme power and knowledge of all things (see fr. 12 and Simplicius’ Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics, 495.20). In this case it is tempting to characterize Mind in theistic terms. Both of these temptations should be avoided, for Anaxagoras remained fully naturalistic in his philosophy. In fact, the uniqueness of Anaxagoras is that he proposed a rationalistic governing principle that remained free from the mythical or theological characteristics of prior cosmogonies. His philosophical successors, particularly Socrates, Plato and Aristotle, are very excited to find in Anaxagoras a unifying cosmic principle which does not allude to the whims of the gods. They hope to find in him an extension of this principle into a purpose-driven explanation for the universe. Alas, they are all disappointed that Anaxagoras makes no attempt to develop his theory of Mind in such a way.

What Socrates, Plato and Aristotle were hoping to discover in Anaxagoras was not simply an account of how the cosmos originated (an efficient cause), but an explanation for why and for what purpose the cosmos was initiated (a final cause). Their initial excitement about his theory is replaced by disillusionment in the fact that Anaxagoras does not venture beyond mechanistic explanatory principles and offer an account for how Mind has ordered everything for the best. For example, in the Phaedo, Socrates discusses how he followed Anaxagoras’ argument with great joy, and thought that he had found, “a teacher about the cause of things after my own heart” (97d). Socrates’ joy is rather short-lived: “This wonderful hope was dashed as I went on reading and saw that the man made no use of Mind, nor gave it any responsibility for the management of things, but mentioned as causes air and ether and water and many other strange things” (98b). Similarly, Aristotle calls Anaxagoras a sober and original thinker, yet chastises him for using Mind as a deus ex machina to account for the creation of the world: “When he cannot explain why something is necessarily as it is, he drags in Mind, but otherwise hew will use anything rather than Mind to explain a particular phenomenon” (Metaphysics, 985a18). Despite the fact that Anaxagoras did not pursue matters as far as his teleologically-minded successors would have liked, his theory of Mind served as an impetus toward the development of cosmological systems that speculated on final causes. On the flip side, Anaxagoras’ lack of conjecture into the non-mechanistic forces in the world also served as an inspiration to the more materialistic cosmological systems that followed.

b. The Nature of Mind

Thus far, we have examined the role of Mind in the development of the world. But what exactly is Mind, according to Anaxagoras? Based on the evidence in the fragments, this is a rather difficult question to answer, for Mind appears to have contradictory properties. In one small fragment, for example, Anaxagoras claims that mind is the sole exception to the principle that there is a portion of everything in everything, yet this claim is immediately followed by the counter claim, “but Mind is in some things too” (frag. 11). Elsewhere, Anaxagoras emphasizes the autonomy and separateness of Mind:

The rest have a portion of everything, but Mind is unlimited and self-ruled and is mixed with no thing, but is alone and by itself. For if it were not by itself but were mixed with something else, it would have a share of all things, if it were mixed with anything. For in everything there is a portion of everything, as I have said before. And the things mixed together with it would hinder it so that it would rule no thing in the same way as it does being alone and by itself. For it is the finest of all things and the purest, and it has all judgment about everything and the greatest power. (frag. 12)

He goes on to say, however, that Mind “is very much even now where all other things are too, in the surrounding multitude and in things that have come together in the process of separating and in things that have separated off” (frag. 14).

Most commentators maintain that Anaxagoras is committed to a dualism of some sort with his theory of Mind. But his Mind/matter dualism is such that both constituents appear to be corporeal in nature. Mind is material, but it is distinguished from the rest of matter in that it is finer, purer and it appears to act freely. This theory is best understood by considering Anaxagoras’ contention that plants possess minds. It is the mind of a plant which enables it to seek nourishment and grow, but this dynamic agent in a plant is not distinct from the plant itself. This would have been a common biological view for the time, but where Anaxagoras is novel is that he extends the workings of “mind” at the level of plants and animals into a cosmic principle which governs all things. The Mind of the cosmos is a dynamic governing principle which is immanent to the entire natural system while still maintaining its transcendental determining power. From Anaxagoras’ perspective it appears to be a principle which is both natural and divine.

5. Other Theories

Anaxagoras’ theory of things and his postulation of Mind as a cosmic principle are the most important and unique aspects of his philosophy. A few other theories are worth mentioning, though it should be pointed out that many of them are probably not original and our primary knowledge of these views arises from second-hand sources.

As a natural scientist and philosopher of his day, Anaxagoras would have been particularly concerned with the subjects of astronomy and meteorology and he made some significant contributions in these areas. It was mentioned above that his outlook on the heavenly bodies played a part in his condemnation in Athens. His beliefs about the earth, moon and sun are clearly articulated in the following lengthy quote from Hippolytus, a source from the late second century CE:

The earth [according to Anaxagoras] is flat in shape. It stays up because of its size, because there is no void, and because the air, which is very resistant, supports the earth, which rests on it. Now we turn to the liquids on the earth: The sea existed all along, but the water in it became the way it is because it suffered evaporation, and it is also added to from the rivers which flow into it. Rivers originate from rains and also from subterranean water; for the earth is hollow and has water in its hollows. The Nile rises in the summer because water is carried down into it from the snow in the north.The sun, the moon, and all the heavenly bodies are red-hot stones which have been snatched up by the rotation of the aether. Below the heavenly bodies there exist certain bodies which revolve along with the sun and the moon and are invisible….The moon is below the sun, closer to us. The sun is larger than the Peloponnesus. The moon does not shine with its own light, but receives its light from the sun…. Eclipses of the moon occur when the earth cuts off the light, and sometimes when the bodies below the moon cut off the light. Eclipses of the sun take place at new moon, when the moon cuts off the light…. Anaxagoras was the first to describe the circumstances under which eclipses occur and the way light is reflected by the moon. He said that the moon is made of earth and has plains and gullies on it. The Milky Way is the light of those stars which are not lit up by the sun. (A Refutation of All Heresies, 1, epitome, 3)

A key advantage of Anaxagoras’ belief that the heavenly bodies were simply stone masses was that it enabled him to provide an account of meteorites as bodies that occasionally become dislodged from the cosmic vortex and plummet to earth. Plutarch attests that Anaxagoras was credited with predicting the fall of a meteorite in 467 BCE, but it is unclear from the historical attestations whether Anaxagoras’ theory predated or was prompted by the event.

Along with his contributions in Astronomy and Meteorology, Anaxagoras proposed a theory of sensation that works on the principle of difference. The assumption behind Anaxagoras’ theory is that there is some sort of qualitative change that occurs with any sensation or perception. When a cold hand touches a hot object the agent will only experience the sensation of heat because her hand is cold and the hot object has brought about some sort of change. Therefore, in order for this change (the sensation) to occur, it is necessary that unlike things interact with each other, i.e., hot with cold, light with dark. If like things interact—hot with hot, for example—then no change occurs and there is no sensation. Perception works the same way as our sense of touch. Humans are able to see better during the daytime because our eyes are generally dark. Furthermore, perception works the same way as touch for Anaxagoras in that there is a physical interaction with the perceiver and the object perceived. Since a sensation requires an encounter with an opposite, Anaxagoras also maintained that every sensory act is accompanied by some sort of irritation. As Theophrastus notes, “Anaxagoras comes to this conclusion because bright colors are excessively loud noises are irritating, and it is impossible to bear them very long” (On Sense Perception, 27). Anaxagoras theory of sensation and perception is in direct opposition to Empedocles who maintained that perception could be accounted for by an action between like objects.

A couple of final speculations that are worth mentioning pertain to the science of biology. It has already been noted that Anaxagoras believes plants to have minds along with animals and humans. What places humans in a higher category of intelligence, however, is the fact that we were equipped with hands, for it is through these unique instruments that we are able to handle and manipulate objects. Finally, Anaxagoras proposed an hypothesis on how the sex of an infant is determined. If the sperm comes from the right testicle it will attach itself to the right side of the womb and the baby will be a male. If the sperm comes from the left testicle it will attach itself to the left side of the womb and the baby will be a female.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. New York, NY: Routledge, 1996.
  • Furley, David. Anaxagoras, “Plato and Naming of Parts.” Presocratic Philosophy. Eds. Victor Caston and Daniel W. Graham. Burlington VT: Ashgate Publishing Limited, 2002. 119-126.
  • Gershenson, Daniel E. and Greenberg, Daniel A. Anaxagoras and the Birth of Physics. New York: Blaisdell Publishing Company, 1964. [It should be pointed out that scholars have been rather critical of this work, but it is a rather helpful reference for sources on Anaxagoras.]
  • Graham, Daniel, “The Postulates of Anaxagoras”, Apeiron 27 (1994), pp.77-121.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. A History of Greek Philosophy. Vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1965.
  • Kirk, G.S., Raven, J.E. and Schofield, M. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd ed. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • McKirahan, Richard D. Philosophy Before Socrates. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1994.
  • Schofield, Malcolm. An Essay on Anaxagoras. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
  • Sider, David. The Fragments of Anaxagoras. 2nd ed. revised. Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag, 2005
  • Taylor, C.C.W. “Anaxagoras and the Atomists.” From the Beginning to Plato: Routledge History of Philosophy, Vol. I. Ed. C.C.W. Taylor. New York, NY: Routledge, 1997. 208-243.

Author Information

Michael Patzia
Central College
U. S. A.

Gregory of Nyssa (c. 335—c. 395 C.E.)

Gregory_of_NyssaGregory of Nyssa spent his life in Cappadocia, a region in central Asia Minor. He was the most philosophically adept of the three so-called Cappadocians, who included brother Basil the Great and friend Gregory of Nazianzus. Together, the Cappadocians are credited with defining Christian orthodoxy in the Eastern Roman Empire, as Augustine (354—430 C.E.) was to do in the West. Gregory was a highly original thinker, drawing inspiration from the pagan Greek philosophical schools, as well as from the Jewish and Eastern Christian traditions, and formulating an original synthesis that was to influence later Byzantine, and possibly even modern European, thought. A central idea in Gregory's writing is the distinction between the transcendent nature and immanent energies of God, and much of his thought is a working out of the implications of that idea in other areas--notably, the world, humanity, history, knowledge, and virtue. This leads him to expand the nature-energies distinction into a general cosmological principle, to apply it particularly to human nature, which he conceives as having been created in God's image, and to rear a theory of unending intellectual and moral perfectibility on the premise that the purpose of human life is literally to become like the infinite nature of God.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. God
  3. World
  4. Humanity
  5. History
  6. Knowledge
  7. Virtue
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gregory of Nyssa was born about 335 C.E. in Cappadocia (in present-day Turkey). He came from a large Christian family of ten children--five boys and five girls. Gregory's family is significant, for two of the most influential people on his thought are two of his elder siblings--his sister Macrina (c.327—379) and Basil (c.330—379), the oldest boy in the family. Along with Basil and fellow-Cappadocian and friend Gregory of Nazianzus (c.329—c.391), Gregory of Nyssa forms the third of a trio of Christian thinkers, collectively known as the Cappadocians, who established the main lines of orthodoxy in the Christian East. Basil, who became the powerful bishop of Caesarea, was the most politically skilled churchman of the group. He appointed his younger brother to the see by which he is now known, and rightly predicted that Gregory would confer more distinction on the obscure town of Nyssa than he would receive from it. Gregory of Nazianzus was a brilliant orator, best known for his five "theological orations," which succinctly summarized the Cappadocian consensus. But the deepest thinker of the three was Gregory of Nyssa. Gregory stands at a crossroads in the theological development of the Christian East: he sums up many of the ideas of his great predecessors, such as the Jewish philosopher Philo of Alexandria (c.20 B.C.E.—c.54 C.E.) and the Christian Origen (c.185—254 C.E.), and initiates the development of themes that will appear in the most prominent of the later Byzantine thinkers, notably the Pseudo-Dionysius (c.500) and Gregory Palamas (1296 - 1359).

As the eldest boy, Basil was the only one of Gregory's siblings to receive a formal education. So Basil in all probability became the teacher of his younger brother. If so, he certainly did an excellent job, for in this case the pupil went on to outshine the teacher. Gregory is thoroughly at home with the philosophers that were in vogue in his day: Plato (427—347 B.C.E.)—especially as "updated" and systematized by Plotinus (204 - 270 CE)--Aristotle (384 - 322 BCE), and the Stoics. On reading his works, one cannot but be struck by the abundance of allusions to the Platonic dialogues. Yet it would be a mistake to say, as Cherniss famously does, that "Gregory . . . merely applied Christian names to Plato's doctrine and called it Christian theology" (The Platonism of Gregory of Nyssa: 62). As will be seen below, there is a pronounced linear view of history in Gregory's thought, which can only be of Hebrew provenance. Moreover, the reader will discover an originality in Gregory that anticipates not only his Byzantine successors, but also such moderns as John Locke (1632 - 1704) and Immanuel Kant (1724 - 1804).

The turning point in Gregory's life came about 379, when both his brother Basil and his sister Macrina died. The burning issue at the time was the Arian heresy, which by then had entered its last and most logically rigorous phase. Arianism was a Christological heresy, named for its founder Arius (c. 256 - 336), that held that Christ was neither divine nor human, but a sort of demigod. The principal defender of Arianism at the time, Eunomius of Cyzicus (c. 325 - c. 394), argued that the Arian doctrine could even be derived from the very concept of God, as will be seen below. For most of this period, the brunt of the battle for orthodoxy had been led by Basil; but when he died, and shortly thereafter Gregory's beloved sister, Gregory felt that the responsibility for defending orthodoxy against the Arian heresy had fallen on his shoulders. Thus began the most productive period of one of the most brilliant of Christian thinkers--far too little known and appreciated in the West.

That period was launched by the publication of his Against Eunomius, Gregory's four-book refutation of that last phase of the Arian heresy. It was followed by many more works, the most significant being On the Work of the Six Days, Gregory's account of the creation of the world; On the Making of Man, his account of the creation of humankind; The Great Catechism, the most systematic statement of Gregory's philosophy of history; On the Soul and the Resurrection, a dialogue with Macrina detailing Gregory's eschatology; Biblical commentaries on the life of Moses, the inscriptions of the Psalms, Ecclesiastes, the Song of Songs, the Beatitudes, and the Lord's Prayer; theological works on Trinitarian and Christological doctrine; and shorter ascetic and moral treatises. Many of these will be discussed below.

Gregory was present at the final defeat of Arianism in the Council of Constantinople of 381. Nothing more is heard from him after about 395 CE.

2. God

Gregory's concept of God is born out of the Arian controversy. Arianism arose out of the need to make sense of the apparently conflicting Biblical depictions of Christ. For example, how is one to understand Jesus' claim that "I and the Father are one" (John 10:30) when it seems to be contradicted by the admission that "the Father is greater than I" (John 14:28)? This sort of problem prompted Arius to postulate that Christ was neither divine nor human, but something in between--a demigod, the oldest and most perfect created being, to be sure, but created nonetheless. By Gregory's day, the leading spokesman for Arian theology was Eunomius of Cyzicus, who argued for Arianism on strictly philosophical grounds. The created nature of Christ could be derived by an analysis of the very concept of God, Eunomius argued; for it is God's essential nature to be unbegotten, whereas Christ is confessed to be "begotten of the Father." If this sort of argument were allowed to stand, what was to become the orthodox faith--the faith enunciated at Nicaea in 325 CE that Christ was literally "of the same substance" with the Father--would be radically transformed.

Gregory counters Eunomius, not by simply staking out the opposite position and defending it with Scriptural artillery, as most of his fellow Nicenes had done, but, more interestingly, by repudiating the central presupposition of Eunomian theology--that one can derive by a process of analysis concepts that are essentially predicated of God. God is incomprehensible; thus, it is presumptuous in the extreme to suppose that God can be defined by a set of human concepts. When we are speaking of God's inner nature, all that we can say is what that nature is not (Against Eunomius II [953 - 960, 1101 - 1108], IV 11 [524]). In saying this, Gregory anticipates the negative theology of the Pseudo-Dionysius and much medieval thought.

Nevertheless, if that were the whole story--if we were left with God's utter incomprehensibility and nothing more--then Gregory's theology would be a very much stunted exposition of Christianity. After all, in the Beatitudes Christ promises, "Blessed are the pure in heart, for they shall see God." (Matt. 5:8) If God's inner nature is knowable only negatively, how is this possible? More generally, if God is simply some remote, unknowable entity, what possible relation to the world could God ever have? Gregory answers these questions by distinguishing between God's nature (phusis) and God's "energies" (energeiai)--the projection of the divine nature into the world, initially creating it and ultimately guiding it to its appointed destination (Beatitudes VI [1269]). The idea of God's energies in Gregory's theology approximates to the Western concept of grace, except that it emphasizes God's actual presence in those parts of creation which are perfected just because of that presence. By distinguishing between God's nature (sometimes he uses the word "substance"--ousia) and God's energies, Gregory anticipates the more famous substance-energies distinction of the fourteenth century Byzantine theologian Gregory Palamas.

Does all of this have any sort of rational basis? Though he frequently appeals to Scripture to support his claims, Gregory does in fact argue for the existence of God. And although he concedes that God's inner nature will always remain a mystery to us, Gregory holds that we can attain some knowledge of God's energies. This does not mean, however, that God does not have a transcendent nature. As will be seen below, for Gregory everything that exists has an inner nature that cannot be known immediately and is knowable only through its energies. God is only the most striking instance of this. If it can be shown that God exists, it follows necessarily in Gregory's mind that God has a nature. But God's existence is derived from our knowledge of God's energies, and those energies are in turn known both indirectly and directly.

The indirect route relies on the order apparent in the cosmos. The fact that the universe is orderly indicates that it is governed according to some rational plan, which implies the existence of a divine Planner (Against Eunomius II [984 - 985, 1009, 1069]; Great Catechism Prologue [12], 12 [44]; Work of the Six Days [73]; Life of Moses II 168 [377 - 380]; Ecclesiastes I [624], II [644 - 645]; Song of Songs I [781 - 784], XI [1009 - 1013], XIII [1049 - 1052]; Beatitudes VI [1268]). In noting this, Gregory is relying on an argument that had been around since the early Stoics--the argument from design (cf. Cicero, Nature of the Gods II 2.4 - 21.56). Now there are several things to notice about this argument. In the first place it is an analogical one: just as a work of art leads us to infer the existence of an artist, so the artistry displayed in the order of nature suggests the existence of a Creator. But if Gregory's argument is nothing more than a generalized appeal to the harmony of the universe, it is not a very persuasive basis for proving the existence of God. For that there are laws of nature is nothing surprising: to have anything at all, from cosmos to quark, is to have order. If this is all that Gregory means, his argument at best reduces to the cosmological, or "first cause," argument that any chain of creating or sustaining causes requires a first member, which "everyone would call God," as Thomas Aquinas puts it (Summa Theologiae I q. 2 a. 3). Such an argument, however, is not very convincing. Why not an infinite chain of causes, for instance? Or even more to the point, why can't things exist on their own? It doesn't seem that the cosmological argument rules out either of these two possibilities.

However, what Gregory has in mind seems to be something more specific. In certain passages Gregory suggests that it is not order in general but the blending of opposites into a harmonious whole that would have never happened spontaneously, but only through the power of a Creator. The heavens accommodate contrary motions, and these motions give rise to unmoving, static laws (Inscriptions of the Psalms I 3 [440 - 441]); heavy bodies are borne downward and light bodies upward, and simple causes bring about complex effects (Soul and Resurrection [25 - 28]). In all these situations opposites not only fail to annihilate each other, but they even contribute to an overall harmony. The emphasis here is not on order in general, but on unexpected order. Given what we know about motion and rest, heaviness and lightness, and the rest, Gregory argues, we would expect to find them excluding, rather than complementing, each other. The fact that they behave in unanticipated ways can only be explained by the exercise of divine power.

Now one could object at this point that these phenomena are by no means surprising; they are surprising to Gregory only because the scientific knowledge of the fourth century is not as advanced as that of the twenty-first. However, it is not all that difficult to abstract the general point from Gregory's particular examples and to bring his argument up-to-date by replacing motion and rest, heaviness and lightness, and so forth with modern examples of phenomena that cannot be explained by any known law of physics (the "lumpiness" of the universe, for example). Yet our hypothetical objector still has a point, as is particularly obvious to us who are examining the thought of a fourth century figure seventeen centuries later. The fact that a phenomenon seems to violate what we think we know of the laws of nature does not imply that it really does violate those laws. Our knowledge may simply be too limited. So the fact that we find order in nature that we don't expect may simply be a function of the limitation of our knowledge rather than of the intervention of God in the world.

The direct method whereby God's energies are known is by examining our own moral purification. It was observed above that Gregory's concept of the divine energies is very similar to the Western concept of grace, except that for Gregory, as for Eastern thinkers in general, grace is due to the actual presence of God and not some action at a distance. As Gregory puts it, "Deity is in everything, penetrating it, embracing it, and seated in it" (Great Catechism 25 [65]). So we directly experience the divine energies in the only thing in the universe that we can view from within--ourselves. But God's energies are always a force for good. Thus we encounter them in the experience of virtues such as purity, passionlessness, sanctity, and simplicity in our own moral character: "if . . . these things be in you," Gregory concludes, "God is indeed in you" (Beatitudes VI [1272]).

Some scholars (for example, Balas, Metousia Theou, p. 128) argue that for Gregory energeiai should be translated "operations" rather than "energies," thus bringing Gregory's concept of God's energeiai more into line with Aquinas' concept of God's power (Summa Theologiae I qq. 8, 25), or of God's effects (cf. Summa Theologiae I q. 2, a. 2; q. 12, a. 12). But such an interpretation will not do for two reasons. First, Gregory insists that God exists in God's energeiai just as much as in God's nature (Against Eunomius I 17 [313], cf. Letter to Xenodorus). He could not say that if God's energeiai were merely God's operations. Second, it was shown above that Gregory uses the concept of God's energeiai to explain how the "pure in heart" can "see God." Once again, one cannot "see God" in God's operations, except in a metaphorical sense; but one can literally "see God" with the spiritual sense of sight (on the spiritual senses, see below) if God is, as Gregory claims, actually "present within oneself" (Beatitudes VI [1269]).

3. World

Gregory's account of the creation of the world reflects the nature-energies logic developed in his polemic against Eunomius. The account unfolds via an allegorical reflection on the first chapter of Genesis, and closely follows the much earlier work of Philo of Alexandria. Like Philo (Creation of the World 3.13), Gregory does not take literally the temporal sequence depicted therein; rather, he envisions creation as having taken place all at once (Work of the Six Days [69 - 72, 76]). Within this atemporal framework, the key "event" was the creation of the firmament on the second day (Work of the Six Days [80 - 85]), for it is the firmament that divides the intelligible world, created on the first day (Work of the Six Days [68 - 85]), from the sensible world, created on days three through six (Work of the Six Days [85 - 124])--again, broadly similar to Philo (Creation of the World 7.29 - 10.36, 44.129 - 44.130). Now the intelligible world was by Gregory's day pictured as a pleroma of Platonic forms existing as ideas in the mind of God; for ever since the advent of Middle Platonism in the first century BCE, the Platonic forms had been transmuted from self-subsistent entities (as Plato conceived them) to ideas in the divine mind. The classic problem with this view, going as far back as Plato himself, was to explain how these forms become instantiated in the material world.

Gregory recasts this problem in theological terms: how could God, who is immaterial, have created the material world? The answer lies in the Aristotelian distinction between the category of substance and the other categories--relation, quality, quantity, place, time, action, passion (Categories 1 - 9)--which Gregory designates with the Stoic term "qualities" (poiotetes). In themselves, qualities are ideas in the mind of God. But they can also be projected out from God; and when that happens, they become visible. Now Gregory observes that although we ordinarily speak of these immanent qualities as inhering in substances, all we really perceive are the qualities of things, not their substances. It is but a short step to the conclusion that a physical object is nothing more than the convergence of its qualities. Thus matter as such doesn't really exist; bodies are really just "holograms" formed by this convergence of qualities. Consequently there is no problem of how an immaterial God could have created a material world, for the world isn't material at all (Against Eunomius II [949]; Work of the Six Days [69]; Making of Man 24 [212 - 213]; Soul and Resurrection [124]).

Elsewhere, Gregory explicitly uses the term "energies" to cover those qualities that are immanent in the physical world. Energies, Gregory contends, are the "powers" and "movements" by which substances are "manifested"; the energy of each thing is its "distinguishing property" (idioma)--a technical Stoic term for a specific, as opposed to a generic, quality. Gregory goes so far as to assert that apart from its energies a nature not only cannot be known, but does not even exist. (Letter to Xenodorus).

Gregory's position bears a curious resemblance to that of John Locke; for according to Locke we know only the nominal essences of things, not their real essences. Thus substance is a "something . . . we know not what" (Essay II xxiii 3). All we really know of substances are their attributes, which constitute their nominal essences (Essay II xxxi 6 - 10, III iii 15 - 19). In this light consider the following passage from Against Eunomius:

Even the inquiry as to that thing in the flesh itself which assumes all the corporeal qualities has not been pursued to any definite result. For if any one has made a mental analysis of that which is seen into its component parts, and, having stripped the object of its qualities, has attempted to consider it by itself, I fail to see what will have been left for investigation. For when you take from a body its color, its shape, its hardness, its weight, its quantity, its position, its forces active or passive, its relation to other objects, what remains that can still be called a body, we can neither see of ourselves nor are taught by Scripture. . . . Wherefore also, of the elements of this world we know only so much by our senses as to enable us to receive what they severally supply for our living. But we possess no knowledge of their substance . . . . (Against Eunomius II [949])

In Gregory's account of creation, the nature-energies distinction, developed to counter Eunomius' defense of the Arian heresy, becomes extended into a general cosmological principle. The most important consequence of this extension is its application to the capstone of the cosmic order--human nature.

4. Humanity

The fundamental fact about human nature according to Gregory of Nyssa is that humans were created in the image of God. This means that because in God a transcendent nature exists which projects energies out into the world, we would expect the same structural relation to exist among human beings vis-a-vis their bodies. And in fact that is precisely what Gregory argues concerning the human nous (a word that is traditionally translated "mind" but which by the fourth century CE had submerged its intellectual connotations into the religious idea of its separateness from the physical world). In fact, so central is the nature-energies distinction to his conception of human personhood, that Gregory, again taking his inspiration from Philo (Creation of the World 46.134 - 46.135), uses it to explain the two accounts of the creation of human beings in Genesis 1 and 2 respectively. The original creation, in which God makes the human race "in our image, after our likeness" (Gen. 1:26) is of the transcendent human nature. The second creation, in which God "formed man of dust from the ground, and breathed into his nostrils the breath of life," (Gen. 2:7) is of the energies of the soul coupled with the body in which they are present (Making of Man 16 - 17 [177 - 189], 22 [204 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [157 - 160]).

The most important characteristic of the nature of the nous is that it provides for the unity of consciousness. How are my varied perceptions, deriving from various sense organs, all coordinated with each other? Aristotle himself had addressed this problem by postulating the existence of a common sense (On the Soul III 1 - 2). But Gregory moves beyond Aristotle's psychological explanation. Using the metaphor of a city in which family members come in by various gates but all meet somewhere inside, Gregory's answer is that this can occur only if we presuppose a transcendent self to which all of one's experiences are referred (Making of Man 10 [152 - 153]). But this unity of consciousness is entirely mysterious and so is much like the mysterious nature of the Godhead (Making of Man 11 [153 - 156]). One is reminded of Kant's theory of the transcendental unity of apperception (Critique of Pure Reason, Transcendental Deduction).

Yet the nous is also extended throughout the body by its energies, which constitute our ordinary psychological experiences (Making of Man 15 [176 - 177]; Soul and Resurrection [41 - 44]). Furthermore, the nous may at different times be more or less present to the body. During waking life the energies of the nous are present throughout the body. But during sleep the presence of nous to body is much more tenuous, and at death is even more so (though not absolutely nonexistent) (Great Catechism 8 [33]; Making of Man 12 - 15 [160 - 177]; Soul and Resurrection [45 - 48]).

The parallels between the divine and the human extend all the way down to the evidential basis for the existence of the human nous. For the existence of the nous rests on a "design" argument analogous to the argument for the energies of God. Indeed the body resembles a machine; and because the latter is governed by nous, it is probable that the former is also. And just as Gregory bases his indirect argument for the existence of God's energies on the unexpected order of natural phenomena, so here he argues that because the components of a living body are observed to behave in a manner "contrary to [their] nature"--air being harnessed to produce sound, water impelled to move upward, and so forth--we may infer the existence of a nous imposing its will upon recalcitrant matter through its energies (Soul and Resurrection [33 - 40]). This should not be particularly surprising since Gregory regards the human body as a miniature, harmonious version of the cosmos as a whole (Inscriptions of the Psalms I 3 [441 - 444]).

There are two further characteristics of the human nous according to Gregory. First, because the human nous is created in the image of God, it possesses a certain "dignity of royalty" (to tes basileias axioma) that is lacking in the rest of creation. For it means that there is an aspect of the human person that is not of this world. Of no other organism can that be said. The souls of other species are totally immanent in their bodies. They have only energies, in other words. Only the human nous has a transcendent nature in addition to its energies. But that more than anything else is what makes us like God. Now God is of supreme worth. Consequently human beings have an inherent "dignity of royalty" just by virtue of being human (Making of Man 2 - 4 [132 - 136]).

Second, the nous is free. In an early work Gregory argues strenuously against astral determinism (On Fate [145 - 173]). In his more mature reflections, Gregory derives the freedom of the nous from the freedom of God. For God, being dependent on nothing, governs the universe through the free exercise of will; and the nous is created in God's image (Making of Man 4 [136]). Once again, absent the theological emphasis, on both counts there is a broad similarity with Kant (cf. Groundwork II - III); and that similarity will only become more obvious when the ways in which Gregory applies these ideas are explored within the context of his philosophy of history.

5. History

Early on, Christian theology developed a distinctive way of conceptualizing God. Rather than a simple monotheism, Christianity held that God, though unitary, could be understood as also existing as a Trinity of three Persons--a Father, the font of the Godhead; a Son, the Word (John 1:1-5) and Wisdom (Prov. 8:22-31) of God, incarnated as Jesus Christ; and a Holy Spirit, who is sent into the world by the Father. Now Gregory lived at a crossroads in the theological understanding of this doctrine. Prior to the era of the ecumenical councils, the first of which was Nicaea, discussed above, the Trinity tended to be viewed as three stages in the outflow of God into the world, with the Father as its source and the Holy Spirit as its termination. Yet beginning with the Church councils, the Trinity gradually came to be understood differently, as three distinctions to be made within God's inner nature itself. Not surprisingly, both models of the Trinity can be found in Gregory. Yet the first is clearly more congenial to his distinctive nature-energies understanding of God than the second. Indeed, one might question whether the second makes any sense at all in light of the typical Byzantine insistence on the incomprehensibility of God's inner nature: if God's nature is incomprehensible, how can we say it is both three and one--unless by doing so we wish to emphasize God's very incomprehensibility?

Not only is the earlier model of the Trinity more consistent with Gregory's view of God as a transcendent nature whose energies are projected into the world; it also adds to it a dynamic and historical dimension that the bare nature-energies distinction fails to capture on its own. As noted above, the Father is always transcendent; and at the other extreme, the Holy Spirit is God's glory (Song of Songs VI [1117]): it "manifests [the Son's] energy" (Great Catechism 2 [17]) in the world. It is the second Person of the Trinity who is the most interesting because it provides Gregory with the conceptual apparatus to explain God's operation in history, for the point at which the second Person enters the world becomes the point in time in which God is more intimately present to the world than before.

Gregory's philosophy of history begins with the fall of Adam from perfection. Earlier it was noted that according to Gregory humankind was fashioned in two creations--one of the nature of the nous, the other of its energies together with the body. The reason for the second creation was that God foresaw that humans would sin and so be unable to reproduce in a disembodied, angelic way; thus, they required bodies to allow them to propagate (Making of Man 16 - 17 [177 - 189], 22 [204 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [157 - 160]). But the provision of bodies brings in its wake the tragic reality of death and sin, the overcoming of which was the purpose of the incarnation of Christ (Great Catechism 8 [33]).

Gregory's Christology is the story of the entry of the second Person of the Trinity into the world. In Gregory's words,

For although this last form of God's presence amongst us is not the same as that former presence, still his existence amongst us equally both then and now is evidenced: now he rules in us in order to hold together that nature in being; then he was transfused in our nature, in order that our nature might by this transfusion of the divine become itself divine--being rescued from death and put beyond the reach of the tyranny of the Adversary. For his return from death becomes to our mortal race the commencement of our return to immortal life. (Great Catechism 25 [65 - 68])

In saying that initially Christ entered "our nature," Gregory is echoing the typical Eastern Christian understanding of Christ's saving work; for according to that tradition, Christ healed the effects of the fall of humankind in the same way as he healed the sick in his earthly ministry--simply by touching. Moreover, because, as Gregory of Nazianzus put it, "what was not assumed was not healed" (Letters 101.5), Christ had to touch all aspects of human existence from birth to death (Great Catechism 27 [69 - 72], 32 [77 - 80]). Thus the former had to wait until the disease of human sinfulness had fully manifested itself (Great Catechism 29 [73 - 76]). And by submitting to the latter, Christ offered himself in bondage to Satan in exchange for the whole of humanity, whom Satan then had under his tyranny (Great Catechism 22 - 24 [60 - 65]). Precisely how, in Christ, the divine thus entered into human nature we can never know--any more than we can understand the presence of our own souls to our bodies (Great Catechism 11 [44]).But after the resurrection of Christ, the second Person of the Trinity is no longer just "transfused in our nature," but now "rules in us." In other words, the second Person is now immanent in the world in the institution of the Church; for "he who sees the Church sees Christ" (Song of Songs XIII [1048]). Indeed, Gregory deploys, once again, his characteristic insistence on the unexpected unity of opposites, this time in the Church's sacraments--life through death, justification through sin, blessing through curse, glory through disgrace, strength through weakness, and so forth--to argue for Christ's continued, miraculous presence in his Church (Song of Songs VIII [948 - 949], XIII [1045 - 1052]). For this reason, Gregory subscribes to a realist theory of the sacraments. As baptism is to the soul, so the Eucharist is to the body (Great Catechism 37 [93]). In the former case, the presence of Christ "transforms what is born with a corruptible nature into a state of incorruption" (Great Catechism 33 [84], cf. 34 [85]). In the latter, Christ "disseminates himself in every believer through that flesh, whose substance comes from bread and wine, blending himself with the bodies of believers, to secure that, by this union with the immortal, man, too, may be a sharer in incorruption"--a process Gregory calls metastoicheiosis, "transelementation" (Great Catechism 37 [97]).

In the Resurrection, Christ "knitted together [the soul and body of humankind] . . . in a union never to be broken" (Great Catechism 16 [52], cf. 35 [89]) and "recalled [our] diseased nature by repentance to the grace of its original state" (Great Catechism 8 [37]). This is difficult to understand unless one notes that Gregory describes Christ's saving work in the language of the Platonic forms (Great Catechism 16 [52], 32 [80 - 81]), which were classically construed as the originals of which the things that participate in them are mere images. Thus the resurrection and deification of Christ's human nature are the prototypes of those to follow. The key idea here seems to be, once again, that human beings were created in God's image. Formerly, that image was seen in the structural relation between the nature and energies of the human nous; now it is projected onto the axis of history.

Participation in Christ's resurrection guarantees the resurrection of the body on the part of humanity. How does this happen? For one thing, as was noted earlier, Gregory holds that the nous is never completely separated from the body anyway, so in a sense there is no paradox in its revivification, But aren't the bodily components scattered to the four winds after the decay of the corpse in the grave? How can they ever be reassembled? Gregory indeed addresses this problem and argues, strangely, that each particle of the body is stamped with one's personal identity, and so it will be possible for the nous to eventually recognize and reassemble them all (Making of Man 26 - 27 [224 - 229], Soul and Resurrection [73 - 80]).

Similarly, the logical consequence of Christ's deification is the apokatastasis--the restoration of humanity to its unfallen state. Because evil is a privation of the good and is therefore limited, Gregory believes that there is a limit to human degradation. At some point, everyone must turn around and strive for the good. Besides, the ultimate good, which is God, is infinitely attractive. Thus, Gregory endorses Origen's (First Principles I 6.3, II 10.4 - 10.8, III 6.5 - 6.6) much-maligned theories of remedial punishment and universal salvation (Great Catechism 8 [36 - 37], 26 [69], 35 [92]; Making of Man 21 - 22 [201 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [97 - 105, 152, 157 - 160]). In other words, for Gregory as for his intellectual ancestor Origen, everyone--even Satan himself (Great Catechism 26 [68 - 69])--will eventually be saved. This means that there is no such thing as eternal damnation. Hell is really purgatory; punishment is temporary and remedial. As Gregory puts it in a colorful metaphor, the process of purgation is like drawing a rope encrusted with dried mud through a small aperture: it's hard on the rope, but it does come out clean on the other side (Soul and Resurrection [100]).

The final component of Gregory's eschatology is his famous theory of perfection, which is derived from his conviction, which he inherits from Plato (Theaetetus 176b1 - 2) through Origen (First Principles III 6.1), that the purpose of human life is to achieve nothing less than likeness to God (homoiosis theoi). But there would seem to be a problem here: if God's very essence is incomprehensible, how can we know what God is really like? The answer lies in the life of Christ, whose purpose was to demonstrate what God is like--an idea Gregory also borrows from Origen (First Principles I 2.8). Consequently, it is sufficient if we use Christ's life as a model for our own (On Perfection [264 - 265, 269]). Nevertheless, it remains that God's nature is infinitely removed from ours. But that doesn't mean that striving to become like God is pointless; it only means that the process of perfection is unending (Against Eunomius I 15 [301], 22 [340], II [940 - 941], III 6.5 [707]; Great Catechism 21 [57 - 60]; Making of Man 21 [201 - 204]; Soul and Resurrection [96 - 97, 105]; On Perfection [285]). This idea forms the core of Gregory's epistemology and ethics, which will be summarized below.

6. Knowledge

Gregory's epistemological views are nicely brought out in his reflections on the life of Moses. The central feature of Gregory's very sensitive analysis is the sequence of three theophanies that punctuate Moses' life (Song of Songs XII [1025 - 1028]). Moses is pictured as one who has a thirst for utter intimacy with God, and the three theophanies are stages on his journey to that intimacy. The first theophany is the burning bush (Life of Moses II 1 - 116 [297 - 360]). In a traditional vein, Gregory takes light to be a symbol of knowledge. So the first stage of Moses' progress is the acquisition of purely intellectual knowledge of God. This procedure is clearly rational; and Gregory will be found in what follows applying that quintessentially rational criterion--consistency--to the acquisition of religious truth.

To do this, Gregory recognizes, one must resort to philosophy as a source of conceptual tools. But philosophy in his day was almost wholly associated with paganism. So Gregory's attitude toward philosophy is somewhat ambiguous. At one time he portrays philosophy, like Moses' stepmother, as barren (Life of Moses II 10 - 12 [329]), and, like the Egyptian whom Moses killed, as something to be striven against (Life of Moses 13 - 18 [329 - 332]). Later, he recites with approval the common Christian interpretation of the Israelites' spoiling of the Egyptians as a lesson to Christians on the importance of appropriating pagan wisdom in explaining Christian doctrine (Life of Moses II 115 [360]). But Gregory's true position seems to lie between these two extremes: philosophy is useful if properly "circumcised," that is, culled of any "foreskin" alien to the spirit of Christianity (Life of Moses II 39 - 40 [337]).

Of the same ilk is Gregory's hermeneutical principle of distinguishing between the literal narrative (historia) of a Biblical passage and the spiritual contemplation (theoria) of it. In the tradition of Philo (Creation of the World 1.1 - 2.12) and Origen (First Principles I Pref., IV 1.1 - 3.5), he produces several arguments in favor of the allegorization of Scripture: (1) it is practiced by Christ, (2) it is recommended by Paul, (3) it makes passages edifying that would otherwise be immoral, and (4) it makes sense of passages that would otherwise be unintelligible or impossible (Song of Songs Preface [756 - 764]). This procedure is obviously predicated on the imperative of integrating Scripture into the entire matrix of worldly knowledge. Gregory never doubts that this matrix should be internally consistent; and he unselfconsciously employs the rule that of two claims that are mutually inconsistent, the more trumps the less edifying.

Up to this point intellectual development is characterized by the rigorous application of the rational criterion of consistency. But for Gregory the next two theophanies go far beyond the veneer of wisdom that mere logical consistency provides. The second theophany occurs atop Mount Sinai (Life of Moses II 117 - 201 [360 - 392]), and here we find not light but darkness. Thus the Israelites were first led through the desert by a cloudy pillar; and finally they arrived at the mountain of divine knowledge, which was wrapped in darkness. Thus when it comes to a more profound understanding of God, the relevant visual metaphor is darkness, not light. Similarly, the relevant auditory metaphor is silence, not speech (Ecclesiastes VII [732]). At this stage Moses learns a much deeper fact about God--that all the language we use of God is only superficial and that a truer understanding of God will only reveal God's utter incomprehensibility. One who becomes aware of God's complete mysteriousness has, paradoxically, learned more about God than the most articulate theologian.

At this stage there is no longer any reliance on the physical senses; indeed, as has been seen, at this level sight and hearing shut down. Instead, the vision of God is mediated by the so-called "spiritual senses," an idea Gregory's inherits from his theological mentor Origen (Song of Songs I 4, II 9 - 11, III 5). God cannot be perceived with the external senses, but some sort of mystical awareness of God is achievable internally. In this vein it is significant that, when discussing the spiritual senses, Gregory most often appeals, not to the "higher" senses of sight and hearing, but to the more intimate senses of smell, taste, and touch as metaphors by which to describe them (cf. Song of Songs I [780 - 784], III [821 - 828], IV [844]).

The third and final theophany revolves around Moses' vision of God's glory from the cleft in a rock (Life of Moses II 202 - 321 [392 - 429]). Moses, as Gregory interprets him, is one of those who crave ever more intimate communion with God. Earlier he had requested to know God's name; now he asks to behold God's glory. So God directs Moses to the cleft of a rock and walks by, placing a hand over the cleft to obscure Moses' sight; only after God has passed is the hand removed, but by now all Moses can see is God's back. Thus Moses finally realizes that the longing for utter intimacy with God can never be satisfied--faith will never be transformed into understanding (cf. Against Eunomius II [941])--but nevertheless "what Moses yearned for is satisfied by the very things which leave his desire unsatisfied" (Life of Moses II 235 [404]). Because God is an infinite being, the desire to know God is an infinite process; but in Gregory's eyes this really makes it much more satisfying than some static Beatific Vision. The process of becoming ever closer to God does not cease at physical death (which is, after all, just one among many passing events punctuating human existence), but continues forever.

When reflecting on Gregory's theory of knowledge as developed in The Life of Moses, one is struck by his commitment to rationalism--this despite his ambivalence on the value of pagan wisdom. Scripture for him is merely the starting point of the intellectual quest; and, given his reliance on allegory as a tool of exegesis, even that is brought within the ambit of a rational worldview. However, for Gregory the quest does not end with reason; rather, because God is utterly mysterious and infinitely remote, the quest is capped by a mystical ascent that always approaches but never reaches its destination. This intellectual dynamic is paralleled by a moral one, which will be sketched in what follows.

7. Virtue

Gregory's ethical thought explores the implications of the theme of the "dignity of royalty" of the human person, which, as has been seen, derives from the idea that humans, and humans alone, were created in the image of God. This is perhaps the most far-reaching theme of Christian ethics. For it means that because there is a part of the human person that is literally not of this world, human beings are possessed of an intrinsic worth which is unique in creation. This idea obviously imposes certain obligations on us in relation to both ourselves and others. To others we owe mercy (Beatitudes V [1252 - 1253]) and the Christian virtue of agape (Beatitudes VII [1284]). To ourselves we owe the effort to overcome the deficiencies in our likeness to God; for we are unable to contemplate God directly, and morally our free will has been compromised by the passions (pathe). Thus with respect to ourselves we must strive for intellectual and moral perfection (Beatitudes III [1225 - 1228], V [1253 - 1260).

Because he was committed to the idea that humans have a unique value that demands respect, Gregory was an early and vocal opponent of slavery and also of poverty. Against the former Gregory marshals three arguments (Ecclesiastes IV [665]): (1) Only God has the right to enslave humans, and God does not choose to do so; indeed, it was God who gave human beings their free wills. (2) How dare a person take that precious entity--the only part of the created order to have been made in God's image--and enslave it! (3) As humans who were created in the divine image, all people are radically equal; therefore, it is hubristic for some to arrogate to themselves absolute authority over others. Against the latter, he appeals, once again, to the "dignity of royalty" theme--that poverty is inconsistent with the rulership bestowed on humankind at its creation (On Compassion for the Poor [477]). Both slavery and poverty sully the dignity of human beings by degrading them to a station below the purple to which they were rightfully born; and although we may congratulate ourselves on having outlawed slavery, it is important to remember that for Gregory poverty is no different.

Moral progress is defined by two phases. Initially we must pursue the Stoic ideal of apatheia (passionlessness; cf. Diogenes Laertius, Lives VII 117), but in moderation (Beatitudes II [1216]). However, Gregory makes it clear that this moderation is due only to the exigencies of life in the flesh. At some point we must go beyond being satisfied with moderation and strive for a life which, in its breadth, is one of complete, not partial, virtue (Beatitudes IV [1241]), and, in its depth, is a matter of continual, unceasing perfection (Beatitudes IV [1244 - 1245]). The former idea, the unity of the virtues, Gregory derives, once again, from the Stoics (cf. Diogenes Laertius, Lives VII 125); but the latter is entirely his own.

Again, Gregory distinguishes between the Old Law and the New Law, which is built on the Old but goes beyond it (Beatitudes VI [1273 - 1276]). The Old Law deals with externals--works. But the New Law deals, not with works, but with the psychological springs from which works originate. To perfect one's outward behavior is one thing; to purify one's own heart is quite another. Thus, for example, whereas the Old Law prohibited murder, the New Law forbids even anger; and whereas the Old Law prohibited adultery, the New Law forbids even lust. Combining this theme with the one discussed in the last paragraph, one must conclude that Gregory sees moral progress as moving from a state of finite, external virtue to one of infinite, internal progress.

Once again, the similarity to Kant is striking. Like Gregory, Kant distinguishes four kinds of duty--perfect and imperfect duties to ourselves and to others (Metaphysical Principles of Virtue Introduction). More importantly, he distinguishes between duties of right and duties of virtue (Metaphysical Principles of Right Introduction III, Metaphysical Principles of Virtue Introduction VII). And the differences between duties of right and of virtue are similar to the distinctions Gregory draws between moderation and infinite perfection and between the Old and the New Law. Duties of right tend to deal with externals and, as "thou shalt nots," can be completely fulfilled. Duties of virtue, on the other hand, tend to deal with the will and, as "thou shalts," can never be completely fulfilled. In fact, in his famous discussion of the postulate of immortality Kant argues that the process of moral perfection is limitless and that if "ought" implies "can" it must be possible for humans to engage in an unending pursuit of perfection (Critique of Practical Reason Dialectic IV; cf. Metaphysical Principles of Virtue I 22).

8. Conclusion

This paper has tried to make clear what a rich resource of ideas we have in Gregory of Nyssa. What is also of great historical interest is Gregory's pivotal role in the development of Western consciousness. Gregory takes numerous ideas from the Judaeo-Christian, particularly Philonian-Origenist, tradition and from the pagan Middle Platonist and Neoplatonist schools, digests them into a very original synthesis and in expounding that synthesis develops ideas that anticipate later Byzantine thinkers such as the Pseudo-Dionysius and Gregory Palamas. Not only that, but several of Gregory's most important theories bear some resemblance to modern thinkers such as John Locke and Immanuel Kant (though through what channels of transmission, if any, is unclear--perhaps John Scotus Eriugena (c. 810 - c. 877), who quotes him extensively, and the Cambridge Platonists of the seventeenth century). Given all that, and given Gregory's relative absence from most standard treatments of Western thought, I think may be fair to say that Gregory of Nyssa is one of the most under-appreciated figures in Western intellectual history.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Greek Texts

  • Gregor von Nyssa: Aus einem Briefe an Xenodorus. In Analecta Patristica: Texte und Abhandlungen der Griechischen Patristik, edited by Franz Diekamp, pp. 13 - 15. Orientalia Christiana Analecta 177. Rome: Pontificium Institutum Orientalium Studiorum, 1938.
    • This is the source for an important fragment discussing Gregory's concept of "energies."
  • Gregorii Nysseni Opera. Edited by Werner Jaeger, et al. Leiden: Brill, 1960 - 1998.
    • This critical edition of Gregory's works is rapidly replacing the much older Migne edition. However the edition has not yet been completed.
  • Patrologia Graeca, vols. 44 - 46. Edited by J. P. Migne. Paris: Migne, 1857 - 1866.
    • In the above citations I have placed page references to the Migne edition (which is still the only complete edition of Gregory's works) in brackets.

b. Translations

  • From Glory to Glory: Texts from Gregory of Nyssa's Mystical Writings. Edited by Jean Danielou. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1997.Gregory of Nyssa: Homilies on Ecclesiastes. Translated by Stuart G. Hall and Rachel Moriarty. Proceedings of the Seventh International Colloquium on Gregory of Nyssa. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1993.
  • Life of Moses. Translated by Abraham J. Malherbe and Everett Ferguson. Classics of Western Spirituality. New York: Paulist Press, 1978.
  • On the Inscriptions of the Psalms. Translated by Ronald E. Heine. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995.
  • Saint Gregory of Nyssa: Ascetical Works. Translated by Virginia W. Callahan. The Fathers of the Church, vol. 58. Washington: Catholic University Press, 1967.
  • Saint Gregory of Nyssa: Commentary on the Song of Songs. Translated by Casimir McCambley. Archbishop Iakovos Library of Ecclesiastical and Historical Sources, no. 12. Brookline: Hellenic College Press, 1987.
  • Select Writings and Letters of Gregory, Bishop of Nyssa. Translated by William Moore and Henry A. Wilson. A Select Library of Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers of the Christian Church, 2d series, vol. 5. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1954. Note that Book II of Against Eunomius in this edition is now regarded as Book IV (usually referred to under various titles as a separate work), Books III - XII are now regarded as Sections 1 - 10 of Book III, and the "Answer to Eunomius' Second Book" is now regarded as Book II.
  • St. Gregory of Nyssa: The Soul and the Resurrection. Translated by Catharine P. Roth. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1993.
  • The Lord's Prayer, The Beatitudes. Translated by Hilda C. Graef. Ancient Christian Writers, vol. 18. New York: Newman Press, 1954.

c. Secondary Sources

  • Balas, David L. Metousia Theou: Man's Participation in God's Perfections according to Saint Gregory of Nyssa. Rome: Pontificium Institutum Sancti Anselmi, 1966.Balthasar, Hans Urs von. Presence and Thought: An Essay on the Religious Philosophy of Gregory of Nyssa. San Francisco: Ignatius Press, 1995.
  • Barnes, Michel Rene. The Power of God: Dunamis in Gregory of Nyssa's Trinitarian Theology. Washington: Catholic University Press, 2001.
  • Callahan, J. F. "Greek Philosophy and the Cappadocian Cosmology." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 12 (1958): 30 - 57.
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Author Information

Donald L. Ross
Georgetown University

U. S. A.

Cicero: Academic Skepticism

cicero-02Cicero (106 to 43 B.C.E.) adopted the philosophical view of the Academic skeptics as a young man sometime in the 80's. In 89/8, Philo of Larissa, the head of Plato's Academy, fled from Athens to Rome for political reasons. While at Rome, Cicero attended Philo’s public lectures and began to study philosophy with him. Cicero also studied with the most prominent representatives of other Hellenistic philosophical schools: Posidonius (a Stoic), Zeno of Citium and Phaedrus (Epicureans), and Cratippus (a Peripatetic). Although the Academy probably ceased to exist as an institution after Philo’s death in 84, Cicero continued to champion its methodology in his philosophical dialogues.

The Academic position appealed to Cicero for a variety of reasons (Section 1). The Academics argued on both sides of every issue in order to undermine the dogmatic confidence of their interlocutors. Cicero's teacher Philo also applied this method in order to determine which position enjoyed the most rational support. Given his rhetorical and forensic skills, Cicero likely found this method attractive. It was also ideal for his project of inducing the ruling class Romans to take up the practice of philosophy. Rather than present his personal views, Cicero laid out in dialogue form the strongest arguments he could mine from other philosophical texts. The idea was to encourage the reader to come to his own conclusion, but even more importantly, to adopt the Academic method of inquiry. Perhaps the most attractive feature of Academic philosophy for Cicero was the intellectual freedom guaranteed by the method. The Academic is bound to no particular doctrine as an Academic. He is only bound to accept the verdict of his best rational assessment of the arguments pro and con.

Cicero asserts that the reasons for his Academic allegiance are set out fully in his Academica (De Natura Deorum 1.11). Although these Academic books are fragmentary, they nonetheless provide a detailed account of the dispute between the Academics and Stoics on the possibility of knowledge (Sections 2 and 3) along with Philo's explanation for how we can manage quite well without knowledge (Section 4).

Table of Contents

  1. The Skeptical Academy and its Appeal to Cicero
  2. Arguments For and Against Stoic Epistemology in the Academica
  3. Indirect Arguments in Support of Stoic Epistemology in the Academica
  4. The Positive Fallibilism of the Philonian Academy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Latin Texts and Translations
    2. Select Bibliography of Secondary Literature

1. The Skeptical Academy and its Appeal to Cicero

There were some important variations among the Academics during the Academy’s skeptical period (c. 268/7 B.C.E to 1st century B.C.E.), but there is also a unifying feature. They all focused squarely, if not exclusively, on refutation. Inspired by Socrates (as he appears in some of Plato’s dialogues), they sought to combat the overly confident attitude of the dogmatists. Since the Stoics were the most influential dogmatists of the time, the skeptical Academics devoted much of their energy to combating them in particular. (Dogmatism in the Hellenistic period is simply a matter of positively affirming that one knows the truth of some systematically related philosophical propositions—it need not have the pejorative connotation currently associated with it.)

In order to refute their opponents, the Academics argued dialectically. Rather than assert a position themselves, they would reveal to the interlocutor that his beliefs are mutually inconsistent and thus that he is not able to justify his claim to knowledge. For example, suppose I claim to know that justice is whatever the strong say it is. Then, in response to a skeptic’s questioning, I am led on the basis of my own premises to conclude that justice is not whatever the strong say it is. It follows that I did not really know what I claimed to know. The operative assumption is that if I had known what justice is, I would have been able to show why my belief is true. If I contradict myself or run out of plausible reasons, then I do not know what justice is after all—even if my belief turns out to be true, I do not know why it is true.

Later Academics also began arguing on both sides of every issue, pro and con. Some apparently sought to show that nothing whatsoever could be known about the issue in question. To accomplish this end, they showed others that there are equally strong arguments for and against, and thus no compelling reason to accept any position. Others employed the same method in order to discover which side of an issue could be most plausibly defended. But all of the Academics agreed that the Stoics had failed to adequately defend their epistemology; that is, they had not shown that knowledge is possible (much more on this below in sections 2 and 3).

Cicero found the later Academic position appealing for a variety of reasons. The method of arguing pro and con was a natural fit with his tremendous oratorical and forensic skill. As a lawyer and orator he was pleased by the Academy’s insistence on teaching rhetoric along with philosophy on the grounds that the two disciplines were mutually supportive. He also found the position ideally suited to his philosophical project of inspiring the Roman ruling class to take up the practice of philosophy. In his dialogues he employs the Academic method with the intention of encouraging his readers to think for themselves rather than to rely on authority.

He was perhaps most attracted by the Academics’ intellectual freedom. In his earliest statement of Academic allegiance, Cicero remarks that he will gladly change his opinion if someone points out his error. For it is not shameful to have insufficiently understood something. It is shameful, however, to have persevered foolishly and for a long time with insufficient understanding. The reason for this is that insufficient understanding is due to the common weakness of mankind. It is, to some extent inevitable, or at least excusable. Foolish perseverance, however, can be avoided, and hence is shameful and blameworthy. (De Inventione 2.9) Cicero describes such perseverance as the stubborn adherence to one’s position because he has come to feel some affection for it. The Academic, by contrast, is supposed to have no extra-rational motives in defending his view or in persevering, when or if he does.

Part of the rationale for this way of proceeding is that we cannot fully appreciate the relative strengths and weaknesses of the available philosophical positions unless we have thoroughly explored what can be said for and against them. To align oneself to a philosophical position prior to this is premature. As we start out we lack the knowledge or wisdom we seek, and thus we are not in a position to adequately judge which system or which philosopher to follow. Once one undertakes the Academic project, he or she may find, as Cicero did, that one lifetime is not sufficient for completing the project and taking a final stand.

This freedom to change one’s position in accordance with a new assessment of the arguments may appear to dispense with any concern for consistency. Suppose for example that I no longer believe that the arguments in favor of going to war with Carthage are compelling. While I previously believed Rome was justified in going to war, I now believe the opposite. As an Academic I am free to change my position as often as I like. I am not bound by any doctrinal constraints due to my philosophical allegiance. And I am not bound by what I formerly believed. Remaining consistent with my former beliefs is never as important as accepting the verdict of my current assessment of the arguments.

Academic freedom is not an end in itself however; it is a means to arriving at the most rationally defensible position. This is why Cicero characterizes the Academic’s method as aimed at drawing out and articulating that view which can be maintained most consistently (Academica 2.9) and as aimed at revealing what is true or at least the closest approximation to the truth (Academica 2.7, 2.65-66, De Officiis 2.8, Tusculan Disputations 1.8). The consistency sought is an accord with the rational evidence and not with one's previous beliefs.

Cicero frequently singles out this freedom as the most definitive and attractive feature of the Academics' philosophical practice (for example, De Legibus 1.36, Academica 2.134, Tusculan Disputations 4.83, 5.33, 5.82, De Officiis 2.7, 3.20). They alone are free to accept whatever strikes them as most plausible at that moment (see Section 4 below for more on Academic probabilism).

2. Arguments For and Against Stoic Epistemology in the Academica

During his final encyclopedic burst of dialogues (46-44 B.C.), Cicero wrote his epistemological work, the Academica. The original version contained two books named after the principal interlocutor in each, Catulus and Lucullus. The latter of the two is extant, and generally referred to as Ac. 2 or Lucullus (= Luc.). Cicero revised these original two books, dividing them into four, and replaced Lucullus with Varro as principal interlocutor throughout. Only about the first fourth of the revised version is extant. It is generally referred to as Ac. 1.

In these books Cicero presents arguments for and against the Stoic theory of knowledge as well as the Academics' own positive, fallibilistic alternative. It should be noted that ethics and epistemology are inextricably connected in the Academic books. Cicero remarks on several occasions that what they are investigating is the sage—that is, an ideal of the perfectly wise human being. Ultimately, the question about the possibility of knowledge on the Stoic account, and in Hellenistic philosophy in general, is a question about the possibility of wisdom. The Hellenistic philosophers followed Plato’s Socrates in taking their primary task to be the discovery of the best human life.

In order to meet this challenge, Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism, developed an account of how the knowledge that Socrates sought—that is, the knowledge that guides one in living the best possible human life—could in fact be attained. That it could be attained he established on the grounds that the universe is providentially arranged. From the providential arrangement it follows that human beings must be equipped to satisfy their desire for knowledge, for Nature would not have acted so capriciously as to give us such an important desire without also providing the means to fulfill it.

If one developed his natural abilities in accordance with Nature he would eventually learn to infallibly distinguish what is true from what is false, at least with regard to matters pertaining to happiness. The sage is not omniscient, but he is infallible. His knowledge guarantees that he will always live in accordance with nature, which is identical to being virtuous and happy.

All of the sage’s beliefs are true, and grasped in such a way that no experience and no argument is able to dislodge him from his conviction. This irrefutability depends crucially on the fact that all of the sage’s beliefs are true and firmly grasped as such. If he were to hold even one false belief he might be persuaded to rely on it in abandoning true beliefs. So we can see that the sage’s knowledge is systematic in that each of his true beliefs is supported by the others.

The foundation of this account of knowledge is a type of impression about which we cannot be mistaken. This type of impression provides us with a criterion of truth, that is, a measuring stick one can use to determine what is and what is not the case. If the Academics could succeed in showing that there are no such impressions, they would effectively undermine the possibility of attaining the knowledge built upon them.

Thus, the central issue in Ac. 2 is whether or not an impression can be apprehended or grasped in such a way as to guarantee its truth. Zeno described such an impression as cognitive, or mentally graspable (katalêpton), and defined it as one that

(1) comes from what is the case, that is, some existent state of affairs
(2) accurately conveys all the relevant features of what it comes from, and
(3) cannot be exactly like an impression that comes from what is not the case (Ac. 2.77, cp. Sextus’ account at Adversus Mathematikos [= M] 7.248).

Katalêpsis occurs when one assents to a cognitive impression, thereby firmly grasping its truth. So whenever one assents to a cognitive impression one necessarily forms a true belief.

The pressing question is whether one can learn to distinguish cognitive from non-cognitive impressions. It seems that one can never know whether (1) and (2) have been satisfied except by inspecting the perceptual content of the impression. If so, this opens the way for the Academics’ main objection. (It should be noted that the Stoics did not think all cognitive impressions are perceptual. We may have cognitive impressions of evaluative states of affairs—for example that it is good for us to help our friend. However most of the evidence regarding the possibility of such impressions is limited to perceptual cases, and so the following discussion will be similarly limited.)

The Academics demanded that the Stoics produce an instance of this cognitive grasping that is immune to skeptical counterexamples, that is, immune to scenarios in which a true impression provides the same sensory evidence as its false imitator. Apparently there is a plentiful supply of such counterexamples, and the Academics spent a great deal of effort developing them. (Ac. 2.42) One type illustrates cases of misidentification: for example, identical twins, eggs, statues, or imprints in wax made by the same ring. (Ac. 2.84-87) Another type involves cases of illusion, dreams and madness. (Ac. 2.88-91)

So it seems that any example of an allegedly cognitive impression offered by the Stoics can be countered by the Academics’ doppelganger or a scenario in which some mental defect and not the object is responsible for the perceptual content of the impression. In either case, the Academics challenge the third characteristic above of cognitive impressions. This challenge is evident in Cicero’s report. (Ac. 2.83, cf. 2.40) The Academics agree with the Stoics that some impressions are true and some are false, and that false impressions are never cognitive. They also agree that if there were no differences between two impressions then these impressions must either both be cognitive or both fail to be cognitive, that is, either the perceptual content of both guarantee their truth or fails to guarantee their truth. In other words, if there were no differences between the two impressions it cannot be the case that one is cognitive and the other is not. The crucial premise, and the crux of the debate, is the Academics' claim, contrary to (3) above, that

(4) for every true impression there may exist a false one that is identical (that is, qualitatively, not numerically).

If we grant (4), then there can be no impression whose perceptual content guarantees its truth; that is, there can be no cognitive impressions. Imagine that you have received an exceedingly clear and distinct impression of an orange. No matter how much you seek to corroborate the truth of this impression, or acquire an even clearer and more distinct impression, it may still turn out to be false. Based on the way it appears, you can never know whether it is a true impression or a false one that is qualitatively identical to the true one. The possibility of error inevitably enters if we must recognize an impression as cognitive for it to play its intended epistemic role.

In response to (4), the Stoics insisted that no two impressions can be identical (Ac. 2.50). So even though two impressions may seem identical, there will still be distinguishable features. In these sorts of cases we must sharpen our skills and refrain from assenting in the meantime (Ac. 2.56-57). But Cicero replies that it makes no difference whether the impressions are strictly identical or only indistinguishable to us (Ac. 2.85). The issue, as he understands it, is whether we are ever actually in a position to accurately identify an impression as cognitive on the basis of its perceptual content.

This interpretation may be unfair to the Stoics however. At one point Lucullus, the spokesman for the Stoics in the Academica, compares assenting to cognitive impressions to the sinking of a scale's balance when weight is put on it. The mind necessarily yields and cannot refrain from giving its approval to what is perspicuous. (Ac. 2.38) Sextus also attributes this view to later Stoics: when the cognitive impression lacks any obstacles it lays hold of us by the hair and practically drags us to assent. (M 7.257) In the end, assent must still be voluntary. But what these passages suggest is some sort of natural fit between cognitive impressions and our rational faculty such that cognitive impressions are, at least potentially, compelling in a way that false impressions cannot be. According to this view, cognitive impressions affect the properly trained mind in a way that is quite different from the way false impressions affect the same mind. If there is this natural fit between cognitive impressions and our rational faculty, then perhaps it is possible after all to acquire the necessary level of discernment to guarantee that one will only assent to cognitive impressions.

Even so, Cicero was apparently satisfied that the Stoics had not succeeded in showing that cognitive impressions provide us with a criterion of truth in practice. He was more convinced by the seemingly limitless supply of false impressions that we cannot currently distinguish from true ones than by the remote possibility of developing our powers of discernment to overcome such possible deceptions.

3. Indirect Arguments in Support of Stoic Epistemology in the Academica

Lucullus also presents some indirect arguments. He assumes the truth of Cicero's Academic position (akatalêpsia, that is, the denial of the possibility of katalêpsis) and derives unacceptable consequences. There are two types of such argument: first that akatalêpsia is self-refuting or inconsistent (Ac. 2.33, 44, 58, cf. also 111), and second that akatalêpsia removes the possibility of certain sorts of successful action, especially virtuous action (Ac. 2.19-27, 32-39). These are versions of the two most often repeated arguments against virtually every ancient skeptic. In this context, however, they are specifically tailored as responses to the rejection of the Stoic criterion.

First, consider the charge that akatalêpsia is self-refuting. Lucullus remarks that the Academics' crucial premise (4) tells us that there are (or at least may be) no differences between any given true impression and a false one. And yet the Academics also claim that some impressions are true and some are false, and this implies that there is some difference between them. (Ac. 2.44) Thus in rejecting katalêpsis, the Academics inconsistently argue that there is and there is not a difference between any given true impression and a false one.

There is an easy rejoinder available. Cicero need only claim that there are no perceptual differences between any given true impression and a false one. This is consistent with saying that there are causal differences, specifically that true impressions come from what is the case and false ones do not. Cicero does not deny that truth exists, but rather that we can grasp it with certainty. (Ac. 2.111) So the problem lies not with the world, but rather with our inability to develop our powers of discernment to the level required by the Stoic theory. No matter how much practice we may have at distinguishing eggs, there may always be a pair of eggs whose similarities exceed our ability.

But Lucullus’ objection is not merely that akatalêpsia entails the impossibility of correctly identifying which of my impressions are true. His objection also includes the claim that akatalêpsia entails the eradication of any adequate conception of truth. (Ac. 2.33) If we have no adequate conception of truth, however, we cannot consistently assert that some impressions are true and some are false. In other words, we should not accept that there is a real distinction between truth and falsity, right and wrong, or any other pair, unless we are confident that our corresponding conceptions of each accurately reveal this distinction. Granting this point, the difficulty for the Stoics lies in explaining why akatalêpsia entails the eradication of any adequate conception of truth in the first place.

Unfortunately, Lucullus does not elaborate on this point. But the explanation must have something to do with the Stoic view of oikeiôsis, the providential process by which Nature guides the moral and intellectual development of all human beings. In sketching the Stoic view of oikeiôsis, we will also arrive at the second sort of objection mentioned above, namely that akatalêpsia removes the possibility of certain sorts of successful action, especially virtuous action.

The Stoics believe that Nature implants in each of us a love of ourselves that is expressed in our primary and earliest drive towards self-preservation. We are naturally disposed to choose what is in accordance with our nature and reject what is opposed or harmful to it. As a result of this innate tendency, we all inevitably develop accurate conceptions (prolêpseis) of what is helpful and what is harmful with respect to self-preservation. This explains, among other things, the instinctive drive of newborns to nurse: the breast is perceived as beneficial.

These naturally developed conceptions must be veridical in keeping with the providence of nature. If they were misleading it would threaten our existence as a species, and it would be impossible to develop such faulty conceptions further into the organized bodies of knowledge exhibited in skillful activity. Nature does not guarantee that we will develop our naturally acquired conceptions into systematic bodies of knowledge and ultimately into virtuous dispositions; neither does Nature guarantee that all acorns will grow into magnificent oaks. But the raw material is provided in both cases.

Assenting to cognitive impressions is essential to the process by which we develop our naturally developed conceptions (prolêpseis) into the more precise conceptions (ennoiai) that regulate our rational judgments. For example, in De Finibus 3, Cicero's Stoic spokesman Cato describes the process by which our natural disposition towards self-preservation is transformed into a true conception of the good. Our drive for self-preservation leads us to accurate conceptions of what is valuable or beneficial. Then, if we reason correctly about the nature of this value, we gradually discern what is genuinely valuable, the good itself. (De Finibus 3.16 ff.) But again it would not be possible to arrive at a true conception of the good if the raw material were somehow misleading.

Lucullus remarks that the mind "seizes some impressions [presumably cognitive ones] in order to make immediate use of them, others, which are the source of memory, it stores away so to speak, while all the rest it arranges by their likenesses, and thereby conceptions of things are produced…" (Ac. 2.30, tr. Long and Sedley [= LS] 40N) So we arrive at our conceptions in general by performing mental operations on sensory experience. (cf. Diogenes Laertius 7.53) If we cannot rely on the accuracy of sensory experience, that is if we deny the possibility of katalêpsis, then it will be impossible to form an accurate conception of truth, or anything else. This in turn undermines our ability to distinguish the true from the false in general.

Cognitive impressions are thus part of a natural fit between the world and our rational faculties—they indicate a basic or immediate way in which the world is intelligible to us. By denying the existence of cognitive impressions, Lucullus claims the Academics obliterate this crucial link and render the world ultimately unintelligible. They "tear out the very tools or equipment of life, or rather they actually ruin the foundations of the whole of life and rob the living being itself of the mind which gives it life…" (Ac. 2.31, tr. LS 40N) And he asks, if the conceptions that we form on the basis of our experience "were false or imprinted by the kind of impressions which were indiscernible from false ones, how on earth could we make use of them?" (Ac. 2.22, tr. LS 40M, cf. Ac. 2.19-20) Lucullus must mean "how could we successfully make use of them?"—otherwise, we could simply say "poorly and unreliably." His question presupposes the apparent success we have had in organizing sensory experience into the systematic bodies of knowledge that are employed in skillful activities. To account for this success he thinks we must acknowledge that some impressions are cognitive.

The denial of katalêpsis also eliminates the possibility of virtue or wisdom. If we cannot form an accurate conception of the good, then we can never be sure that any of our particular actions are in fact good. Personifying wisdom, Lucullus remarks that she cannot possibly be wisdom if she is doubtful and in ignorance regarding the ultimate good which provides the measure against which we evaluate everything. (Ac. 2.24) For example, suppose I assent to the proposition that it is good for me to teach my students about skepticism. The Stoics believe that if my conception of the good is incorrect, or even if I do not know whether it is correct, the resulting action is not virtuous. It may be the right thing to do, but virtue requires that I know it is right, and that my conviction is unshakeable by any argument. Katalêpsis provides the basis for such certainty. The denial of katalêpsis thus removes the possibility of virtue.

The most obvious weakness of these objections is the extent to which they presuppose controversial elements of the Stoic system. Unless the skeptical opponent accepts these elements, the objections have no force. But Cicero does respond to these objections, perhaps because he accepts much of the Stoic system, though in the provisional way characteristic of an Academic. In his defense of the Academic position he shows how successful and skillful action and even virtue are possible without katalêpsis.

4. The Positive Fallibilism of the Philonian Academy

The development of a positive alternative to Stoic katalêpsis is generally thought to be the result of a misinterpretation of the earlier Academics' more radical skepticism, especially Carneades' skepticism. The radical variety makes no provisions for acquiring beliefs; having successfully refuted every available (if not possible) position, the skeptic’s only option is to suspend judgment and believe nothing. The moderate variety, by contrast, aims at acquiring the most rationally defensible position with the full awareness of one’s fallibility.

Cicero insists that Academics do not deny the existence of true impressions; they deny only the possibility of an infallible grasp of them. He offers no explicit defense for the claim that true impressions exist, but he does recognize the existence of technical expertise; the general accuracy of our impressions would then provide the best explanation for this fact. Thus far he is in agreement with Lucullus: there could be no technical expertise if there were absolutely no distinction between true and false impressions. Technical expertise seems to presuppose that most of the impressions we rely on are in fact true.

Such reliability, however, is completely independent of our ability to infallibly differentiate true from false. As long as we make a responsible and cautious use of our impressions, always allowing for the possibility of error, the occasional deception is no serious cause for alarm.

In response to the Stoic objections that akatalêpsia would lead to inaction, the Academics did suggest that we may get along very well by relying on what appears to be subjectively plausible: Arcesilaus refers to this as what is reasonable (to eulogon), and Carneades as what is plausible (to pithanon). Cicero translates these Greek terms with one of his most important philosophical coinages, probabilitas. Regardless of what his predecessors intended by their skeptical alternatives, Cicero clearly intends that probabilitas is somehow like the truth. He frequently uses probabile and veri simile interchangeably (Ac. 2.7-9, 32, 99, Tusculan Disputations 1.17, 2.5).

Furthermore, he acknowledges that probabilitas is useful both “in the conduct of life and in philosophical investigation and discussion" (Ac. 2.32). So it seems that Cicero is not concerned exclusively with explaining relatively mundane successes like our ability to navigate, or even the more noteworthy successes of science, but also the possibility of making progress philosophically. Indeed, he maintains, both in the Academic books and elsewhere, that virtue is possible without Stoic katalêpsis. This is evident in the character of the "Academic sage."

The Academic sage "is not afraid lest he may appear to throw everything into confusion and make everything uncertain. For if a question be put to him about duty or about a number of other matters in which practice has made him an expert, he would not reply in the same way as he would if questioned as to whether the number of stars is even or odd, and say that he did not know; for in things uncertain there is nothing probable, but in things where there is probability the wise man will not be at a loss either what to do or what to answer" (Ac. 2.110, tr. by H. Rackham). Guided solely by probabilitas, the sage will plan out his entire life (Ac. 2.99).

Cicero is much less forthcoming with regard to the details of how the sage employs probabilitas in adjudicating competing philosophical claims. But that the sage does employ probabilitas in this way is evident from the fact that he accepts the denial of the possibility of katalêpsis as probable. (Ac. 2.110) Such a decision indicates that the sage has weighed both sides of the debate and arrived at his probable judgment as a result.

It is likely that Cicero is following Philo's adaptation of Carneades' account of how we should test our sensory impressions when in doubt. (This is most extensively reported by Sextus Empiricus, M 7.166-189, see also Ac. 2.78). In matters of relatively little importance, or when we don't have time for a more thorough examination we rely on whatever seems immediately plausible. Even though unexamined, such impressions may strike us with varying degrees of force or vividness. But since every individual impression is accompanied by a host of other related impressions, we should examine these as well, time permitting. When none of these concurrent impressions seem false, or inconsistent with the impression in question, our belief is greater. In matters of the greatest importance, especially those pertaining to our happiness, we should go a step further and examine each of the concurrent impressions individually, cross-questioning each of them on the testimony of the others. (M 7.184)

Impressions that survive this scrutiny are most credible. But the degrees of credibility have no upper limit since cross-questioning may proceed indefinitely. What the higher levels of scrutiny have in common is that they are aimed primarily at disconfirmation (M 7.189). In the end, what reveals itself as most credible is what has survived the most extensive attempts at "refutation."

Given that Cicero sees himself as engaged in the same philosophical practice as Carneades, it is likely that disconfirmation plays the same central role in the philosophical application of probabilitas as in the empirical application of Carneades’ criterion. So to employ this fallible criterion in philosophical investigation would require a serious and sustained effort to refute the view in question. If it survives such critical scrutiny, it will appear to be like the truth. Since we are dealing with degrees of justification, approximation to the truth most likely refers to the extent to which the view in question has been rationally defended. The further assumption underlying this is that the truth cannot be refuted. Surviving serious attempts at refutation would then provide inductive evidence of the truth of that view, and the more it survives the more it will appear to be like the truth.

Unlike the empirical cases, philosophical issues typically do not force a judgment. We may reflect indefinitely on whether justice is whatever the strong say it is whereas life-and-death, fight-or-flight, judgments cannot wait. This open-endedness is reflected in Cicero's own consideration of the dispute between the Stoics and Peripatetics on the sufficiency of virtue for a happy [eudaimôn] life. Sometimes he was swayed by the Stoics' position that virtue can guarantee a happy life with or without external goods like health and wealth. And sometimes he was swayed by the Peripatetic view that virtue requires at least some of those external goods to secure a happy life. The fact that Cicero continued to the end of his life to struggle with this issue does not mean that he failed as an Academic. Arriving once and for all at the philosophical view that can be most consistently maintained is not required; continuing to search for it is.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Latin Texts and Translations

  • Brittain, C., tr. 2006. Cicero: On Academic Scepticism, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Long and Sedley, tr. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volumes 1 and 2, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Long and Sedley provide translations of and commentary on a good portion of the Academica. Their volumes are indispensable to the study of Hellenistic philosophy in general, and the commentary on the selections from the Academica are extremely helpful.
  • Rackham, H., tr. 1933/1994. Cicero: De Natura Deorum, Academica, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • This volume in the Loeb Classical Library contains the Latin text with English translation on facing pages. It is currently the only English translation available of the Academic books in their entirety (as we have them).
  • Reid, J. S. 1885. M. Tulli Ciceronis, Academica, London: MacMillan.
    • For textual analysis and philosophical commentary, Reid's edition is still valuable.

b. Select Bibliography of Secondary Literature

  • Brittain, C. 2001. Philo of Larissa: the Last of the Academic Sceptics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Though Brittain does not deal specifically with Cicero as a philosopher, he makes extensive use of the Academic books in reconstructing the positions held by Philo as well as the history of the Academy in general. This is a very carefully researched and comprehensive book. In addition to presenting a stimulating reconstruction of Philo's views, there is a very useful appendix containing all the testimonia on Philo along with translations.
  • Glucker, J. 1978. Antiochus and the Late Academy, Hypomnemata 56, Göttingen.
  • Glucker, J. 1988. "Cicero's Philosophical Affiliations," in Dillon, J.M. and A.A. Long, eds., The Question of "Eclecticism": Studies in Later Greek Philosophy, Berkeley.
  • Glucker, J. 1995. "Probabile, Veri Simile, and Related Terms," in Powell, ed.
  • Görler, W. 1995. "Silencing the troublemaker: De Legibus 1.39 and the Continuity of Cicero's Scepticism," in Powell, ed.
    • This is a response to an earlier article by Glucker which argues that Cicero changed his affiliation twice, once from a youthful adherence to the skeptical Academy to the more dogmatic position of Antiochus, and then later in life back again.
  • Mansfeld, J. and B. Inwood, eds. 1997. Assent and Argument: Studies in Cicero's Academic Books, Leiden: Brill.
    • This and the following volume are highly re